Plato: Phaedo

The Phaedo is one of the most widely read dialogues written by the ancient Greek philosopher Plato.  It claims to recount the events and conversations that occurred on the day that Plato’s teacher, Socrates (469-399 B.C.E.), was put to death by the state of Athens.  It is the final episode in the series of dialogues recounting Socrates’ trial and death.  The earlier Euthyphro dialogue portrayed Socrates in discussion outside the court where he was to be prosecuted on charges of impiety and corrupting the youth; the Apology described his defense before the Athenian jury; and the Crito described a conversation during his subsequent imprisonment.  The Phaedo now brings things to a close by describing the moments in the prison cell leading up to Socrates’ death from poisoning by use of hemlock.

Among these “trial and death” dialogues, the Phaedo is unique in that it presents Plato’s own metaphysical, psychological, and epistemological views; thus it belongs to Plato’s middle period rather than with his earlier works detailing Socrates’ conversations regarding ethics.  Known to ancient commentators by the title On the Soul, the dialogue presents no less than four arguments for the soul’s immortality.  It also contains discussions of Plato’s doctrine of knowledge as recollection, his account of the soul’s relationship to the body, and his views about causality and scientific explanation.  Most importantly of all, Plato sets forth his most distinctive philosophical theory—the theory of Forms—for what is arguably the first time. So, the Phaedo merges Plato’s own philosophical worldview with an enduring portrait of Socrates in the hours leading up to his death.

Table of Contents

  1. The Place of the Phaedo within Plato’s works
  2. Drama and Doctrine
  3. Outline of the Dialogue
    1. The Philosopher and Death (59c-69e)
    2. Three Arguments for the Soul’s Immortality (69e-84b)
      1. The Cyclical Argument (70c-72e)
      2. The Argument from Recollection (72e-78b)
      3. The Affinity Argument (78b-84b)
    3. Objections from Simmias and Cebes, and Socrates’ Response (84c-107b)
      1. The Objections (85c-88c)
      2. Interlude on Misology (89b-91c)
      3. Response to Simmias (91e-95a)
      4. Response to Cebes (95a-107b)
        1. Socrates’ Intellectual History (96a-102a)
        2. The Final Argument (102b-107b)
    4. The Myth about the Afterlife (107c-115a)
    5. Socrates’ Death (115a-118a)
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. General Commentaries
    2. The Philosopher and Death (59c-69e)
    3. Three Arguments for the Soul’s Immortality (69e-84b)
    4. Objections from Simmias and Cebes, and Socrates’ Response (84c-107b)
    5. The Myth about the Afterlife (107c-115a)
    6. Socrates’ Death (115a-118a)

1. The Place of the Phaedo within Plato’s works

Plato wrote approximately thirty dialogues.  The Phaedo is usually placed at the beginning of his “middle” period, which contains his own distinctive views about the nature of knowledge, reality, and the soul, as well as the implications of these views for human ethical and political life.  Its middle-period classification puts it after “early” dialogues such as the Apology, Euthyphro, Crito, Protagoras, and others which present Socrates’ search—usually inconclusive—for ethical definitions, and before “late” dialogues like the Parmenides, Theaetetus, Sophist, and Statesman.  Within the middle dialogues, it is uncontroversial that the Phaedo was written before the Republic, and most scholars think it belongs before the Symposium as well.  Thus, in addition to being an account of what Socrates said and did on the day he died, the Phaedo contains what is probably Plato’s first overall statement of his own philosophy.  His most famous theory, the theory of Forms, is presented in four different places in the dialogue.

2. Drama and Doctrine

In addition to its central role in conveying Plato’s philosophy, the Phaedo is widely agreed to be a masterpiece of ancient Greek literature. Besides philosophical argumentation, it contains a narrative framing device that resembles the chorus in Greek tragedy, references to the Greek myth of Theseus and the fables of Aesop, Plato’s own original myth about the afterlife, and in its opening and closing pages, a moving portrait of Socrates in the hours leading up to his death.  Plato draws attention (at 59b) to the fact that he himself was not present during the events retold, suggesting that he wants the dialogue to be seen as work of fiction.

Contemporary commentators have struggled to put together the dialogue’s dramatic components with its lengthy sections of philosophical argumentation—most importantly, with the four arguments for the soul’s immortality, which tend to strike even Plato’s charitable interpreters as being in need of further defense.  (Socrates himself challenges his listeners to provide such defense at 84c-d.)  How seriously does Plato take these arguments, and what does the surrounding context contribute to our understanding of them?  While this article will concentrate on the philosophical aspects of the Phaedo, readers are advised to pay close attention to the interwoven dramatic features as well.

3. Outline of the Dialogue

The dialogue revolves around the topic of death and immortality: how the philosopher is supposed to relate to death, and what we can expect to happen to our souls after we die.  The text can be divided, rather unevenly, into five sections:

(1) an initial discussion of the philosopher and death (59c-69e)

(2) three arguments for the soul’s immortality (69e-84b)

(3) some objections to these arguments from Socrates’ interlocutors and his response, which includes a fourth argument (84c-107b)

(4) a myth about the afterlife (107c-115a)

(5) a description of the final moments of Socrates’ life (115a-118a)

The dialogue commences with a conversation (57a-59c) between two characters, Echecrates and Phaedo, occurring sometime after Socrates’ death in the Greek city of Phlius.  The former asks the latter, who was present on that day, to recount what took place.  Phaedo begins by explaining why some time had elapsed between Socrates’ trial and his execution: the Athenians had sent their annual religious mission to Delos the day before the trial, and executions are forbidden until the mission returns.  He also lists the friends who were present and describes their mood as “an unaccustomed mixture of pleasure and pain,” since Socrates appeared happy and without fear but his friends knew that he was going to die.  He agrees to tell the whole story from the beginning; within this story the main interlocutors are Socrates, Simmias, and Cebes.  Some commentators on the dialogue have taken the latter two characters to be followers of the philosopher Pythagoras (570-490 B.C).

a. The Philosopher and Death (59c-69e)

Socrates’ friends learn that he will die on the present day, since the mission from Delos has returned.  They go in to the prison to find Socrates with his wife Xanthippe and their baby, who are then sent away.  Socrates, rubbing the place on his leg where his just removed bonds had been, remarks on how strange it is that a man cannot have both pleasure and pain at the same time, yet when he pursues and catches one, he is sure to meet with the other as well.  Cebes asks Socrates about the poetry he is said to have begun writing, since Evenus (a Sophist teacher, not present) was wondering about this.  Socrates relates how certain dreams have caused him to do so, and says that he is presently putting Aesop’s fables into verse.  He then asks Cebes to convey to Evenus his farewell, and to tell him that—even though it would be wrong to take his own life—he, like any philosopher, should be prepared to follow Socrates to his death.

Here the conversation turns toward an examination of the philosopher’s attitude toward death.  The discussion starts with the question of suicide.  If philosophers are so willing to die, asks Cebes, why is it wrong for them to kill themselves?  Socrates’ initial answer is that the gods are our guardians, and that they will be angry if one of their possessions kills itself without permission.  As Cebes and Simmias immediately point out, however, this appears to contradict his earlier claim that the philosopher should be willing to die: for what truly wise man would want to leave the service of the best of all masters, the gods?

In reply to their objection, Socrates offers to “make a defense” of his view, as if he were in court, and submits that he hopes this defense will be more convincing to them than it was to the jury.  (He is referring here, of course, to his defense at his trial, which is recounted in Plato’s Apology.) The thesis to be supported is a generalized version of his earlier advice to Evenus: that “the one aim of those who practice philosophy in the proper manner is to practice for dying and death” (64a3-4).

Socrates begins his defense of this thesis, which takes up the remainder of the present section, by defining death as the separation of body and soul.  This definition goes unchallenged by his interlocutors, as does its dualistic assumption that body and soul are two distinct entities.   (The Greek word psuchē is only roughly approximate to our word “soul”; the Greeks thought of psuchē as what makes something alive, and Aristotle talks about non-human animals and even plants as having souls in this sense.)  Granted that death is a soul/body separation, Socrates sets forth a number of reasons why philosophers are prepared for such an event.  First, the true philosopher despises bodily pleasures such as food, drink, and sex, so he more than anyone else wants to free himself from his body (64d-65a).  Additionally, since the bodily senses are inaccurate and deceptive, the philosopher’s search for knowledge is most successful when the soul is “most by itself.”

The latter point holds especially for the objects of philosophical knowledge that Plato later on in the dialogue (103e) refers to as “Forms.”  Here Forms are mentioned for what is perhaps the first time in Plato’s dialogues: the Just itself, the Beautiful, and the Good; Bigness, Health, and Strength; and “in a word, the reality of all other things, that which each of them essentially is” (65d).  They are best approached not by sense perception but by pure thought alone. These entities are granted again without argument by Simmias and Cebes, and are discussed in more detail later. .

All told, then, the body is a constant impediment to philosophers in their search for truth: “It fills us with wants, desires, fears, all sorts of illusions and much nonsense, so that, as it is said, in truth and in fact no thought of any kind ever comes to us from the body” (66c).  To have pure knowledge, therefore, philosophers must escape from the influence of the body as much as is possible in this life. Philosophy itself is, in fact, a kind of “training for dying” (67e), a purification of the philosopher’s soul from its bodily attachment.

Thus, Socrates concludes, it would be unreasonable for a philosopher to fear death, since upon dying he is most likely to obtain the wisdom which he has been seeking his whole life.  Both the philosopher’s courage in the face of death and his moderation with respect to bodily pleasures which result from the pursuit of wisdom stand in stark contrast to the courage and moderation practiced by ordinary people.  (Wisdom, courage, and moderation are key virtues in Plato’s writings, and are included in his definition of justice in the Republic.) Ordinary people are only brave in regard to some things because they fear even worse things happening, and only moderate in relation to some pleasures because they want to be immoderate with respect to others.  But this is only “an illusory appearance of virtue”—for as it happens, “moderation and courage and justice are a purging away of all such things, and wisdom itself is a kind of cleansing or purification” (69b-c).  Since Socrates counts himself among these philosophers, why wouldn’t he be prepared to meet death?  Thus ends his defense.

b. Three Arguments for the Soul’s Immortality (69e-84b)

But what about those, says Cebes, who believe that the soul is destroyed when a person dies?  To persuade them that it continues to exist on its own will require some compelling argument.  Readers should note several important features of Cebes’ brief objection (70a-b).  First, he presents the belief in the immortality of the soul as an uncommon belief (“men find it hard to believe . . .”).  Secondly, he identifies two things which need to be demonstrated in order to convince those who are skeptical: (a) that the soul continues to exist after a person’s death, and (b) that it still possesses intelligence.  The first argument that Socrates deploys appears to be intended to respond to (a), and the second to (b).

i. The Cyclical Argument (70c-72e)

Socrates mentions an ancient theory holding that just as the souls of the dead in the underworld come from those living in this world, the living souls come back from those of the dead (70c-d).  He uses this theory as the inspiration for his first argument, which may be reconstructed as follows:

1. All things come to be from their opposite states: for example, something that comes to be “larger” must necessarily have been “smaller” before (70e-71a).

2. Between every pair of opposite states there are two opposite processes: for example, between the pair “smaller” and “larger” there are the processes “increase” and “decrease” (71b).

3. If the two opposite processes did not balance each other out, everything would eventually be in the same state: for example, if increase did not balance out decrease, everything would keep becoming smaller and smaller (72b).

4.  Since “being alive” and “being dead” are opposite states, and “dying” and “coming-to-life” are the two opposite processes between these states, coming-to-life must balance out dying (71c-e).

5. Therefore, everything that dies must come back to life again (72a).

A main question that arises in regard to this argument is what Socrates means by “opposites.” We can see at least two different ways in which this term is used in reference to the opposed states he mentions.  In a first sense, it is used for “comparatives” such as larger and smaller (and also the pairs weaker/stronger and swifter/slower at 71a), opposites which admit of various degrees and which even may be present in the same object at once (on this latter point, see 102b-c).  However, Socrates also refers to “being alive” and “being dead” as opposites—but this pair is rather different from comparative states such as larger and smaller, since something can’t be deader, but only dead.  Being alive and being dead are what logicians call “contraries” (as opposed to “contradictories,” such as “alive” and “not-alive,” which exclude any third possibility).  With this terminology in mind, some contemporary commentators have maintained that the argument relies on covertly shifting between these different kinds of opposites.

Clever readers may notice other apparent difficulties as well.  Does the principle about balance in (3), for instance, necessarily apply to living things?  Couldn’t all life simply cease to exist at some point, without returning?  Moreover, how does Plato account for adding new living souls to the human population?  While these questions are perhaps not unanswerable from the point of view of the present argument, we should keep in mind that Socrates has several arguments remaining, and he later suggests that this first one should be seen as complementing the second (77c-d).

ii. The Argument from Recollection (72e-78b)

Cebes mentions that the soul’s immortality also is supported by Socrates’ theory that learning is “recollection” (a theory which is, by most accounts, distinctively Platonic, and one that plays a role in his dialogues Meno and Phaedrus as well).  As evidence of this theory he mentions instances in which people can “recollect” answers to questions they did not previously appear to possess when this knowledge is elicited from them using the proper methods. This is likely a reference to the Meno (82b ff.), where Socrates elicits knowledge about basic geometry from a slave-boy by asking the latter a series of questions to guide him in the right direction. Asked by Simmias to elaborate further upon this doctrine, Socrates explains that recollection occurs “when a man sees or hears or in some other way perceives one thing and not only knows that thing but also thinks of another thing of which the knowledge is not the same but different . . .” (73c).  For example, when a lover sees his beloved’s lyre, the image of his beloved comes into his mind as well, even though the lyre and the beloved are two distinct things.

Based on this theory, Socrates now commences a second proof for the soul’s immortality—one which is referred to with approval in later passages in the dialogue (77a-b, 87a, 91e-92a, and 92d-e). The argument may be reconstructed as follows:

1. Things in the world which appear to be equal in measurement are in fact deficient in the equality they possess (74b, d-e).

2. Therefore, they are not the same as true equality, that is, “the Equal itself” (74c).

3. When we see the deficiency of the examples of equality, it helps us to think of, or “recollect,” the Equal itself (74c-d).

4. In order to do this, we must have had some prior knowledge of the Equal itself (74d-e).

5. Since this knowledge does not come from sense-perception, we must have acquired it before we acquired sense-perception, that is, before we were born (75b ff.).

6. Therefore, our souls must have existed before we were born. (76d-e)

With regard to premise (1), in what respect are this-worldly instances of equality deficient?  Socrates mentions that two apparently equal sticks, for example, “fall short” of true equality and are thus “inferior” to it (74e).  Why?  His reasoning at 74b8-9—that the sticks “sometimes, while remaining the same, appear to one to be equal and another to be unequal”—is notoriously ambiguous, and has been the subject of much scrutiny.  He could mean that the sticks may appear as equal or unequal to different observers, or perhaps they appear as equal when measured against one thing but not another.  In any case, the notion that the sensible world is imperfect is a standard view of the middle dialogues (see Republic 479b-c for a similar example), and  is emphasized further in his next argument.

By “true equality” and “the Equal itself” in premises (2)-(4), Socrates is referring to the Form of Equality.  It is this entity with respect to which the sensible instances of equality fall short—and indeed, Socrates says that the Form is “something else beyond all these.”  His brief argument at 74a-c that true equality is something altogether distinct from any visible instances of equality is of considerable interest, since it is one of few places in the middle dialogues where he makes an explicit argument for why there must be Forms. The conclusion of the second argument for the soul’s immortality extends what has been said about equality to other Forms as well: “If those realities we are always talking about exist, the Beautiful and the Good and all that kind of reality, and we refer all the things we perceive to that reality, discovering that it existed before and is ours, and we compare these things with it, then, just as they exist, so our soul must exist before we are born” (76d-e).  The process of recollection is initiated not just when we see imperfectly equal things, then, but when we see things that appear to be beautiful or good as well; experience of all such things inspires us to recollect the relevant Forms.  Moreover, if these Forms are never available to us in our sensory experience, we must have learned them even before we were capable of having such experience.

Simmias agrees with the argument so far, but says that this still does not prove that our souls exist after death, but only before birth.  This difficulty, Socrates suggests, can be resolved by combining the present argument with the one from opposites: the soul comes to life from out of death, so it cannot avoid existing after death as well.  He does not elaborate on this suggestion, however, and instead proceeds to offer a third argument.

iii. The Affinity Argument (78b-84b)

The third argument for the soul’s immortality is referred to by commentators as the “affinity argument,” since it turns on the idea that the soul has a likeness to a higher level of reality:

1. There are two kinds of existences: (a) the visible world that we perceive with our senses, which is human, mortal, composite, unintelligible, and always changing, and (b) the invisible world of Forms that we can access solely with our minds, which is divine, deathless, intelligible, non-composite, and always the same (78c-79a, 80b).

2. The soul is more like world (b), whereas the body is more like world (a) (79b-e).

3. Therefore, supposing it has been freed of bodily influence through philosophical training, the soul is most likely to make its way to world (b) when the body dies (80d-81a).  (If, however, the soul is polluted by bodily influence, it likely will stay bound to world (a) upon death (81b-82b).)

Note that this argument is intended to establish only the probability of the soul’s continued existence after the death of the body—“what kind of thing,” Socrates asks at the outset, “is likely to be scattered [after the death of the body]?” (78b; my italics)  Further, premise (2) appears to rest on an analogy between the soul and body and the two kinds of realities mentioned in (1), a style of argument that Simmias will criticize later (85e ff.).  Indeed, since Plato himself appends several pages of objections by Socrates’ interlocutors to this argument, one might wonder how authoritative he takes it to be.

Yet Socrates’ reasoning about the soul at 78c-79a states an important feature of Plato’s middle period metaphysics, sometimes referred to as his “two-world theory.”  In this picture of reality, the world perceived by the senses is set against the world of Forms, with each world being populated by fundamentally different kinds of entities:

The World of the Senses The World of Forms
Composites (that is, things with parts) Non-composites
Things that never remain the same from one moment to the next Things that always remain the same and don’t tolerate any change
Any particular thing that is equal, beautiful, and so forth The Equal, the Beautiful, and what each thing is in itself
That which is visible That which is grasped by the mind and invisible

Since the body is like one world and the soul like the other, it would be strange to think that even though the body lasts for some time after a person’s death, the soul immediately dissolves and exists no further.  Given the respective affinities of the body and soul, Socrates spends the rest of the argument (roughly 80d-84b) expanding on the earlier point (from his “defense”) that philosophers should focus on the latter. This section has some similarities to the myth about the afterlife, which he narrates near the dialogue’s end; note that some of the details of the account here of what happens after death are characterized as merely “likely.” A soul which is purified of bodily things, Socrates says, will make its way to the divine when the body dies, whereas an impure soul retains its share in the visible after death, becoming a wandering phantom.  Of the impure souls, those who have been immoderate will later become donkeys or similar animals, the unjust will become wolves or hawks, those with only ordinary non-philosophical virtue will become social creatures such as bees or ants.

The philosopher, on the other hand, will join the company of the gods.  For philosophy brings deliverance from bodily imprisonment, persuading the soul “to trust only itself and whatever reality, existing by itself, the soul by itself understands, and not to consider as true whatever it examines by other means, for this is different in different circumstances and is sensible and visible, whereas what the soul itself sees is intelligible and indivisible” (83a6-b4).  The philosopher thus avoids the “greatest and most extreme evil” that comes from the senses: that of violent pleasures and pains which deceive one into thinking that what causes them is genuine.  Hence, after death, his soul will join with that to which it is akin, namely, the divine.

c. Objections from Simmias and Cebes, and Socrates’ Response (84c-107b)

After a long silence, Socrates tells Simmias and Cebes not to worry about objecting to any of what he has just said.  For he, like the swan that sings beautifully before it dies, is dedicated to the service of Apollo, and thus filled with a gift of prophecy that makes him hopeful for what death will bring.

i. The Objections (85c-88c)

Simmias prefaces his objection by making a remark about methodology.  While certainty, he says, is either impossible or difficult,  it would show a weak spirit not to make a complete investigation.  If at the end of this investigation one fails to find the truth, one should adopt the best theory and cling to it like a raft, either until one dies or comes upon something sturdier.

This being said, he proceeds to challenge Socrates’ third argument.  For one might put forth a similar argument which claims that the soul is like a harmony and the body is like a lyre and its strings.  In fact, Simmias claims that “we really do suppose the soul to be something of this kind,” that is, a harmony or proper mixture of bodily elements like the hot and cold or dry and moist (86b-c).  (Some commentators think  the “we” here refers to followers of Pythagoras.)  But even though a musical harmony is invisible and akin to the divine, it will cease to exist when the lyre is destroyed.  Following the soul-as-harmony thesis, the same would be true of the soul when the body dies.

Next Socrates asks if Cebes has any objections.  The latter says that he is convinced by Socrates’ argument that the soul exists before birth, but still doubts whether it continues to exist after death.   In support of his doubt, he invokes a metaphor of his own.  Suppose someone were to say that since a man lasts longer than his cloak, it follows that if the cloak is still there the man must be there too.  We would certainly think this statement was nonsense. (He appears to be refering to Socrates’ argument at 80c-e here.)  Just as a man might wear out many cloaks before he dies, the soul might use up many bodies before it dies.  So even supposing everything else is granted, if “one does not further agree that the soul is not damaged by its many births and is not, in the end, altogether destroyed in one of those deaths, he might say that no one knows which death and dissolution of the body brings about the destruction of the soul, since not one of us can be aware of this” (88a-b).  In light of this uncertainty, one should always face death with fear.

ii. Interlude on Misology (89b-91c)

After a short exchange in the meta-dialogue in which Phaedo and Echecrates praise Socrates’ pleasant attitude throughout this discussion, Socrates begins his response with a warning that they not become misologues.  Misology, he says, arises in much the same way that misanthropy does: when someone with little experience puts his trust in another person, but later finds him to be unreliable, his first reaction is to blame this on the depraved nature of people in general.  If he had more knowledge and experience, however, he would not be so quick to make this leap, for he would realize that most people fall somewhere in between the extremes of good and bad, and he merely happened to encounter someone at one end of the spectrum.  A similar caution applies to arguments.  If someone thinks a particular argument is sound, but later finds out that it is not, his first inclination will be to think that all arguments are unsound; yet instead of blaming arguments in general and coming to hate reasonable discussion, we should blame our own lack of skill and experience.

iii. Response to Simmias (91e-95a)

Socrates then puts forth three counter-arguments to Simmias’ objection.  To begin, he gets both Simmias and Cebes to agree that the theory of recollection is true.  But if this is so, then Simmias is not able to “harmonize” his view that the soul is a harmony dependent on the body with the recollection view that the soul exists before birth.  Simmias admits this inconsistency, and says that he in fact prefers the theory of recollection to the other view.  Nonetheless, Socrates proceeds to make two additional points.  First, if the soul is a harmony, he contends, it can have no share in the disharmony of wickedness.  But this implies that all souls are equally good.  Second, if the soul is never out of tune with its component parts (as shown at 93a), then it seems like it could never oppose these parts.  But in fact it does the opposite, “ruling over all the elements of which one says it is composed, opposing nearly all of them throughout life, directing all their ways, inflicting harsh and painful punishment on them, . . . holding converse with desires and passions and fears, as if it were one thing talking to a different one . . .” (94c9-d5).  A passage in Homer, wherein Odysseus beats his breast and orders his heart to endure, strengthens this picture of the opposition between soul and bodily emotions.  Given these counter-arguments, Simmias agrees that the soul-as-harmony thesis cannot be correct.

iv. Response to Cebes (95a-107b)

1. Socrates’ Intellectual History (96a-102a)

After summarizing Cebes’ objection that the soul may outlast the body yet not be immortal, Socrates says that this problem requires “a thorough investigation of the cause of generation and destruction” (96a; the Greek word aitia, translated as “cause,” has the more general meaning of “explanation”).  He now proceeds to relate his own examinations into this subject, recalling in turn his youthful puzzlement about the topic, his initial attraction to a solution given by the philosopher Anaxagoras (500-428 B.C.), and finally his development of his own method of explanation involving Forms.  It is debated whether this account is meant to describe Socrates’ intellectual autobiography or Plato’s own, since the theory of Forms generally is described as the latter’s distinctive contribution.  (Some commentators have suggested that it may be neither, but instead just good storytelling on Plato’s part.)

When Socrates was young, he says, he was excited by natural science, and wanted to know the explanation of everything from how living things are nourished to how things occur in the heavens and on earth.  But then he realized that he had no ability for such investigations, since they caused him to unlearn many of the things he thought he had previously known.   He used to think, for instance, that people grew larger by various kinds of external nourishment combining with the appropriate parts of our bodies, for example, by food adding flesh to flesh.  But what is it which makes one person larger than another?   Or for that matter, which makes one and one add up to two?  It seems like it can’t be simply the two things coming near one another.   Because of puzzles like these, Socrates is now forced to admit his ignorance: “I do not any longer persuade myself that I know why a unit or anything else comes to be, or perishes or exists by the old method of investigation, and I do not accept it, but I have a confused method of my own” (97b).

This method came about as follows.  One day after his initial setbacks Socrates happened to hear of Anaxagoras’ view that Mind directs and causes all things.  He took this to mean that everything was arranged for the best.  Therefore, if one wanted to know the explanation of something, one only had to know what was best for that thing.  Suppose, for instance, that Socrates wanted to know why the heavenly bodies move the way they do.  Anaxagoras would show him how this was the best possible way for each of them to be.  And once he had taught Socrates what the best was for each thing individually, he then would explain the overall good that they all share in common.  Yet upon studying Anaxagoras further, Socrates found these expectations disappointed.  It turned out that Anaxagoras did not talk about Mind as cause at all, but rather about air and ether and other mechanistic explanations.  For Socrates, however, this sort of explanation was simply unacceptable:

To call those things causes is too absurd.  If someone said that without bones and sinews and all such things, I should not be able to do what I decided, he would be right, but surely to say that they are the cause of what I do, and not that I have chosen the best course, even though I act with my mind, is to speak very lazily and carelessly.  Imagine not being able to distinguish the real cause from that without which the cause would not be able to act as a cause. (99a-b)

Frustrated at finding a teacher who would provide a teleological explanation of these phenomena, Socrates settled for what he refers to as his “second voyage” (99d).  This new method consists in taking what seems to him to be the most convincing theory—the theory of Forms—as his basic hypothesis, and judging everything else in accordance with it.  In other words, he assumes the existence of the Beautiful, the Good, and so on, and employs them as explanations for all the other things.  If something is beautiful, for instance, the “safe answer” he now offers for what makes it such is “the presence of,” or “sharing in,” the Beautiful (100d).  Socrates does not go into any detail here about the relationship between the Form and object that shares in it, but only claims that “all beautiful things are beautiful by the Beautiful” (100d).  In regard to the phenomena that puzzled him as a young man, he offers the same answer.  What makes a big thing big, or a bigger thing bigger, is the Form Bigness.  Similarly, if one and one are said to be two, it is because they share in Twoness, whereas previously each shared in Oneness.

2. The Final Argument (102b-107b)

When Socrates has finished describing this method, both Simmias and Cebes agree that what he has said is true.  Their accord with his view is echoed in another brief interlude by Echecrates and Phaedo, in which the former says that Socrates has “made these things wonderfully clear to anyone of even the smallest intelligence,” and Phaedo adds that all those present agreed with Socrates as well.  Returning again to the prison scene, Socrates now uses this as the basis of a fourth argument that the soul is immortal.  One may reconstruct this argument as follows:

1. Nothing can become its opposite while still being itself: it either flees away or is destroyed at the approach of its opposite.  (For example, “tallness” cannot become “shortness” while still being “hot.”) (102d-103a)

2. This is true not only of opposites, but in a similar way of things that contain opposites.  (For example, “fire” and “snow” are not themselves opposites, but “fire” always brings “hot” with it, and “snow” always brings “cold” with it.  So “fire” will not become “cold” without ceasing to be “fire,” nor will “snow” become “hot” without ceasing to be “snow.”) (103c-105b)

3. The “soul” always brings “life” with it. (105c-d)

4. Therefore “soul” will never admit the opposite of “life,” that is, “death,” without ceasing to be “soul.” (105d-e)

5. But what does not admit death is also indestructible. (105e-106d)

6. Therefore, the soul is indestructible. (106e-107a)

When someone objects that premise (1) contradicts his earlier statement (at 70d-71a) about opposites arising from one another, Socrates responds that then he was speaking of things with opposite properties, whereas here is talking about the opposites themselves.  Careful readers will distinguish three different ontological items at issue in this passage:

(a) the thing (for example, Simmias) that participates in a Form (for example, that of Tallness), but can come to participate in the opposite Form (of Shortness) without thereby changing that which it is (namely, Simmias)

(b) the Form (for example, of Tallness), which cannot admit its opposite (Shortness)

(c) the Form-in-the-thing (for example, the tallness in Simmias), which cannot admit its opposite (shortness) without fleeing away of being destroyed

Premise (2) introduces another item:

(d) a kind of entity (for example, fire) that, even though it does not share the same name as a Form, always participates in that Form (for example, Hotness), and therefore always excludes the opposite Form (Coldness) wherever it (fire) exists

This new kind of entity puts Socrates beyond the “safe answer” given before (at 100d) about how a thing participates in a Form.  His new, “more sophisticated answer” is to say that what makes a body hot is not heat—the safe answer—but rather an entity such as fire.  In like manner, what makes a body sick is not sickness but fever, and what makes a number odd is not oddness but oneness (105b-c).  Premise (3) then states that the soul is this sort of entity with respect to the Form of Life.  And just as fire always brings the Form of Hotness and excludes that of Coldness, the soul will always bring the Form of Life with it and exclude its opposite.

However, one might wonder about premise (5).  Even though fire, to return to Socrates’ example, does not admit Coldness, it still may be destroyed in the presence of something cold—indeed, this was one of the alternatives mentioned in premise (1).  Similarly, might not the soul, while not admitting death, nonetheless be destroyed by its presence?  Socrates tries to block this possibility by appealing to what he takes to be a widely shared assumption, namely, that what is deathless is also indestructible: “All would agree . . . that the god, and the Form of Life itself, and anything that is deathless, are never destroyed” (107d).  For readers who do not agree that such items are deathless in the first place, however, this sort of appeal is unlikely to be acceptable.

Simmias, for his part, says he agrees with Socrates’ line of reasoning, although he admits that he may have misgivings about it later on.  Socrates says that this is only because their hypotheses need clearer examination—but upon examination they will be found convincing.

d. The Myth about the Afterlife (107c-115a)

The issue of the immortality of the soul, Socrates says, has considerable implications for morality.  If the soul is immortal, then we must worry about our souls not just in this life but for all time; if it is not, then there are no lasting consequences for those who are wicked.  But in fact, the soul is immortal, as the previous arguments have shown, and Socrates now begins to describe what happens when it journeys to the underworld after the death of the body.  The ensuing tale tells us of

(1) the judgment of the dead souls and their subsequent journey to the underworld (107d-108c)

(2) the shape of the earth and its regions (108c-113c)

(3) the punishment of the wicked and the reward of the pious philosophers (113d-114c)

Commentators commonly refer to this story as a “myth,” and Socrates himself describes it this way (using the Greek word muthos at 110b, which earlier on in the dialogue (61b) he has contrasted with logos, or “argument.”).  Readers should be aware that for the Greeks myth did not have the negative connotations it often carries today, as when we say, for instance, that something is “just a myth” or when we distinguish myth from fact.  While Plato’s relation to traditional Greek mythology is a complex one—see his critique of Homer and Hesiod in Republic Book II, for instance—he himself uses myths to bolster his doctrines not only in the Phaedo, but in dialogues such as the Gorgias, Republic, and Phaedrus as well.

At the end of his tale, Socrates says that what is important about his story is not its literal details, but rather that we “risk the belief” that “this, or something like this, is true about our souls and their dwelling places,” and repeat such a tale to ourselves as though it were an “incantation” (114d).  Doing so will keep us in good spirits as we work to improve our souls in this life.  The myth thus reinforces the dialogue’s recommendation of the practice of philosophy as care for one’s soul.

e. Socrates’ Death (115a-118a)

The depiction of Socrates’ death that closes the Phaedo is rich in dramatic detail.  It also is complicated by a couple of difficult interpretative questions.

After Socrates has finished his tale about the afterlife, he says that it is time for him to prepare to take the hemlock poison required by his death sentence.  When Crito asks him what his final instructions are for his burial, Socrates reminds him that what will remain with them after death is not Socrates himself, but rather just his body, and tells him that they can bury it however they want.  Next he takes a bath—so that his corpse will not have to be cleaned post-mortem—and says farewell to his wife and three sons.  Even the officer sent to carry out Socrates’ punishment is moved to tears at this point, and describes Socrates as “the noblest, the gentlest and the best man” who has ever been at the prison.

Crito tells Socrates that some condemned men put off taking the poison for as long as possible, in order to enjoy their last moments in feasting or sex.  Socrates, however, asks for the poison to be brought immediately.  He drinks it calmly and in good cheer, and chastises his friends for their weeping.  When his legs begin to feel heavy, he lies down; the numbness in his body travels upward until eventually it reaches his heart.

Some contemporary scholars have challenged Plato’s description of hemlock-poisoning, arguing that in fact the symptoms would have been much more violent than the relatively gentle death he depicts.  If these scholars are right, why does Plato depict the death scene the way he does?  There is also a dispute about Socrates’ last words, which invoke a sacrificial offering made by the sick to the god of medicine: “Crito, we owe a cock to Asclepius; make this offering to him and do not forget.”  Did Socrates view life as a kind of sickness?

4. References and Further Reading

a. General Commentaries

  • Bostock, D. Plato’s Phaedo. Oxford, 1986.
    • In-depth yet accessible discussion of the dialogue’s arguments (does not include text of the Phaedo).  Includes a helpful chapter on the theory of Forms.
  • Dorter, K. Plato’s Phaedo: An Interpretation. University of Toronto Press, 1982.
    • Reading of the dialogue that combines both dramatic and doctrinal approaches (does not include text of the Phaedo).
  • Gallop, D. Plato: Phaedo. Oxford, 1975.
    • English translation with separate commentary that focuses on the dialogue’s argumentation.
  • Hackforth, R. Plato’s Phaedo: Translated with an Introduction and Commentary. Cambridge, 1955.
    • English translation with running commentary.
  • Rowe, C.J. Plato: Phaedo. Cambridge, 1993.
    • Original Greek text (no English) with introduction and detailed textual commentary.

b. The Philosopher and Death (59c-69e)

  • Pakaluk, M. “Degrees of Separation in the ‘Phaedo.’” Phronesis 48 (2003) 89-115.
    • Discusses Plato’s notion of the soul-body distinction at 63a-69e.
  • Warren, J. “Socratic Suicide.” The Journal of Hellenic Studies 121 (2001) 91-106.
    • On the Platonic philosopher’s attitude toward suicide in the 61e-69e passage.
  • Weiss, R. "The Right Exchange: Phaedo 69a6-c3". Ancient Philosophy 7 (1987) 57-66.
    • Examines the notion that wisdom is the highest goal of the philosopher.

c. Three Arguments for the Soul’s Immortality (69e-84b)

  • Ackrill, J.L. “Anamnēsis in the Phaedo,” in E.N. Lee and A.P.D. Mourelatos (eds.) Exegesis and Argument: Studies in Greek Philosophy Presented to Gregory Vlastos. Assen, 1973. 177-95.
    • On the theory of recollection (73c-75).
  • Apolloni, D. “Plato’s Affinity Argument for the Immortality of the Soul.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 34 (1996) 5-32.
    • A study of the argument at 78b-80d.
  • Gallop, D. “Plato’s ‘Cyclical Argument’ Recycled.” Phronesis 27 (1982) 207-222.
    • On the first argument for the soul’s immortality (69e-72e) and its relation to the other arguments.
  • Matthen, M.  “Forms and Participants in Plato’s Phaedo.”  Noûs 18:2 (1984) 281-297.
    • Discusses Plato’s argument concerning equals at 74b7-c6.
  • Nehamas, A. “Plato on the Imperfection of the Sensible World,” in G. Fine, ed., Plato 1: Metaphysics and Epistemology. Oxford, 1999. 171-191.
    • On Plato’s view of sensible particulars, especially at 72e-78b.

d. Objections from Simmias and Cebes, and Socrates’ Response (84c-107b)

  • Frede, D.  “The Final Proof of the Immortality of the Soul in Plato’s Phaedo 102a-107a.”  Phronesis 23 (1978) 27-41.
    • A defense of Plato’s argument and examination of its underlying assumptions regarding the soul.
  • Gottschalk, H.D. “Soul as Harmonia.” Phronesis 16 (1971) 179-198.
    • Discusses Simmias’ account of the soul beginning at 85e.
  • Vlastos, G. “Reasons and Causes in the Phaedo,” in Plato: A Collection of Critical Essays, Vol. I: Metaphysics and Epistemology.  Garden City, NY: Anchor Books, 1971.
    • Are Forms causes? An examination of 95e-105c.
  • Wiggins, D. “Teleology and the Good in Plato’s Phaedo.”  Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 4 (1986) 1-18.
    • On Socrates’ “second voyage” beginning at 99c2-d1.

e. The Myth about the Afterlife (107c-115a)

  • Annas, J. “Plato’s Myths of Judgment.” Phronesis 27 (1982) 119-43.
    • A study of Plato’s myths in the GorgiasPhaedo, and Republic.
  • Morgan, K.A. Myth and Philosophy from the pre-Socratics to Plato. Cambridge, 2000.
    • Includes extensive background on myth in Plato, as well as discussion of the Phaedo myth in particular.
  • Sedley, D. “Teleology and Myth in the Phaedo.” Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy 5 (1990) 359–83.

f. Socrates’ Death (115a-118a)

  • Crook, J. “Socrates’ Last Words: Another Look at an Ancient Riddle.” Classical Quarterly 48 (1998) 117-125.
    • The papers by Crook and Most (cited below) consider some puzzles regarding Socrates’ final words at the dialogue’s end.
  • Gill, C. “The Death of Socrates.” Classical Quarterly 23 (1973) 25-25.
    • On the finer details of hemlock-poisoning.
  • Most, G.W. “A Cock for Asclepius.” Classical Quarterly 43 (1993) 96-111.
  • Stewart, D. “Socrates’ Last Bath.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 10 (1972) 253-9.
    • Looks at the deeper meaning of Socrates’ bath at 116a.
  • Wilson, E. The Death of Socrates. Harvard University Press, 2007.
    • Includes discussion of the death scene in the Phaedo, as well as its subsequent reception in Western philosophy, art, and culture.

Author Information

Tim Connolly
East Stroudsburg University
U. S. A.

Philosophy of Film: Continental Perspectives

This article introduces the most important perspectives on film (movies) from the continental philosophical perspective. “Continental” is not used as a geographical term, but as an abstract concept referring to nineteenth and twentieth century European philosophical traditions exemplified by German idealism, phenomenology, existentialism, hermeneutics, structuralism, post-structuralism, French feminism, and the Frankfurt School. The continental-friendly philosophy of film that has emerged in Anglophone countries since the 1980s also is taken into account in this article.

If one considers only contributions by well known philosophers, the philosophical output on film might appear relatively meager. Books that deal with the philosophy of film are equally rare. If, however, one considers the scholarly contributions from the entire field of humanities, specifically in the form of film aesthetics and film theory, the body of reflections on film inspired by philosophical ideas (in the most general sense) is impressive. Most of these works are linked to the European philosophical tradition of philosophy of film, which developed from the 1920s onward. Henri Bergson (1859-1941) was the first philosopher to show interest in film, though his influence on continental philosophy of film remained minor – though not inexistent – before the publication of Gilles Deleuze’s two volumes on cinema (1983 and 1985). In the 1980s, two French philosophers, Jean-Louis Schefer and Gilles Deleuze, decided to devote their attention to film studies. These studies began a continuous line of European philosophical works on film that stretched through to today’s writings by Jacques Rancière and Slavoj Žižek. In the English-speaking world, philosophical concepts entered the discourse on film at around the same time. Stanley Cavell’s work The World Viewed: Reflections on the Ontology of Film (1971) was a notable precursor of this tendency. In 1988, Noel Carroll published a critique of contemporary film theory (Mystifying Movies) which he criticized as being overly determined by Psycho-Semiotic Marxist paradigms. In the same year he published Philosophical Problems of Classical Film Theory that examined pre-semiotic theorists like Bazin and Arnheim in an analytical fashion.

Both representatives of the analytical and the continental tradition see thinkers that were active before the analytical-continental divide (for example, Münsterberg, Kracauer) as being central to their film studies; however, the interpretations of such thinkers differ considerably in both traditions.

A significant amount of continental work developed around the British journal Screen, which was very influential in the 1970s and has laid many of the foundations of Lacanian and neo-Marxist film theory.

Analytical philosophy of film has profited greatly from its rich tradition of analytical aesthetics. A significant part of this philosophy has attempted to push its studies in the direction of evidence-based scientific models. Continental thought has typically been inspired by the softer fields of humanities and has displayed a solid amount of political engagement. In the former Soviet Union, a complex discourse on the semiotics of film, inspired by a Russian formalist heritage that has a natural affinity with film, has made numerous philosophical statements.

Table of Contents

  1. What Is Philosophy Of Film?
    1. Continental vs. Analytical
    2. French Philosophy of Film
    3. Philosophy of Film in Other European Countries
  2. An Overview Of Theories
    1. Henri Bergson
    2. Hugo Münsterberg
    3. Formalist Approaches
      1. The Russian Formalism Tradition
        1. Sergei Eisenstein
        2. Vsevolod Pudovkin
        3. Lev Kuleshov
        4. Yuri Lotman
      2. Béla Balász: Film as Language
      3. Mikhail Bakhtin: Dialogicity and Reception
      4. Rationalism: Galvano Della Volpe
      5. Semiotics/Semiology
        1. Gilbert Cohen-Séat
        2. Roland Barthes
        3. Christian Metz
        4. Pier Paolo Pasolini
    4. Cinematographic Ontology and Phenomenology
      1. Phenomenology
        1. Maurice Merleau-Ponty
        2. Amédée Ayfre
      2. Realism:
        1. André Bazin
        2. Siegfried Kracauer
        3. Dziga Vertov
      3. Existentialism
        1. Alexandre Astruc’s Caméra-Stylo
      4. Film as Thought
        1. Jean Epstein: Film as Artificial Intelligence
        2. Jean Mitry
        3. Gilles Deleuze
        4. Filmosophy
      5. Film as Poetic Art: Susanne Langer
    5. Psychology/Psychoanalysis
      1. Rudolf Arnheim
        1. Psychoanalysis vs. Cognitive Science
      2. The Mindscreen Theory
      3. Slavoj Žižek
    6. Walter Benjamin and the Frankfurt School
    7. Hermeneutic Film Analysis
    8. Future Perspectives
  3. References and Further Reading

1. What Is Philosophy Of Film?

Many studies of film do not necessarily claim a specific philosophical heritage, but can be considered as philosophical inasmuch as their approaches are methodologically sophisticated and transgress empiricism. Though it is very difficult to establish positive standards for what is ‘’philosophical’’ and what is not, it can be concurred that an approach is “philosophical” as soon as it uses references to philosophers and some abstract concepts that are not merely technical. A degree of argumentation and claim-making supported by reasons, some sort of evidence, and analysis or interpretation, on the other hand, are not particular to philosophy but are followed by all (human) sciences.

Film Theory

Para-philosophical studies have also been conveniently labelled as ‘film theory’. Strictly speaking, film theory, which develops concepts like ‘narrativity’, ‘diegesis’, ‘genre’ or ‘authorship’ is not a unique philosophy, but is very often part of it. Although parts of film theory and philosophy of film do overlap in both traditions (and since Münsterberg and Arnheim many film theorists have maintained that what they do is also related to the philosophy of film), it is wrong to characterize every “theoretical” reflection on film as philosophical because film theory can also be limited to the analysis of mere technicalities or textual analysis. Here, film theory is not different from literary theory where reflections on authorship or analyses of narrative and genre occur most typically without necessarily receiving the label “philosophy” unless they are imbedded in more “philosophical” considerations. The contemporary Anglophone philosophy of film sees this perspective slightly differently since longstanding reflections on these subjects (by Cavell, Carroll, Bordwell, Gaut, and Branigan) are usually classified as philosophy.

While the degrees of “philosophicality” vary within different interpretations of films, it is safe to assume that any reflective study of the nature of film is philosophical. Whenever scholars attempt to spell out what film is (Is film an art? How is film different from other arts?), their discourse becomes necessarily philosophical. This reflective study is not limited to film, but is true for any academic field (it becomes most obvious in philosophy of science).

Film Aesthetics

Philosophy of film cannot be seen only as a subfield of aesthetics or of the philosophy of art. Philosophy of film also should not be labeled as ‘film aesthetics’. Philosophy of film is able to approach a spectrum of questions so broad that its link with aesthetics can sometimes be maintained only by purely formal reasons. Bergson’s philosophy of film, which has attained a central position in contemporary philosophy of film, was not developed out of an aesthetic interest at all; but film would have served Bergson as merely an illustration for his general philosophical ideas. It is even possible to say that the philosophy of film, just because of its readiness to undertake paradoxical fusions that contrast aesthetics against fields other than aesthetics, develops a discourse that stands out in the entire body of philosophy. Treating, for example, psychoanalytical or cognitive problems as aesthetical phenomena bears an immense critical potential that does not exist to the same extent in other sub-disciplines of philosophy.

Film and Philosophy

Philos-sophia, the ancient Greek term for ‘’love of wisdom’’, can be understood as an immense attempt at interpreting or questioning human existence and the world in its entirety. Logically, film can be one of its subjects. When this is the case, the approach towards film usually exceeds the label of mere interpretation and places film in a relationship with classical philosophical questions such as (its own) essence, truth, or beauty.

Philos-sophia can see film as one of its subjects, but film can also be its object, that is, film can be a philosophy through which a thinker attempts to see the world In other words, film can establish its own stances about essence, truth, or beauty. Theoretically, this can be done with any art form: it is also possible to see painting, literature, or dance as philosophical activities. However, film has been found much more apt for such models because its integrative mode of time, space, images, and movement brings it much closer to thinking (as will be developed below).

The idea of “philosophy of film” is a little like Kant’s “Critique of Pure Reason” because it implies two ideas at the same time. Kant’s title can be understood as (1) “pure reason being criticized” and as (2) “pure reason doing the criticizing.” In the first case, pure reason is a passive object of research undergoing the scrutiny of critical thought while in the second case pure reason is actively imposing its standards on this critical thought. The same is true for the phrase “philosophy of film,” which can mean (1) that film is undergoing a philosophical examination and (2) that film itself helps to develop a certain type of philosophical thinking that will subsequently be imposed upon various subjects of research. Strictly speaking, any outline of the philosophy of film should be divided into two parts: (1) a philosophy about film and (2) film as an philosophy. The latter occupies a prominent place in many recent continental and Anglo-American discourses, and has been defended by Wartenberg (2006), Mulhall (2002), Frampton (2006), and Smuts (2009), and has been criticized by Russell (2000), Murray Smith (2006), Livingston (2009), and Davies (2009). However, in the practice of much of philosophy of film, both approaches often intermingle. Film as a philosophic experience or philosophy as a filmic experience often appear as two sides of the same coin.

Films are similar to dreams and much of what the philosophical tradition has said about the “reality of the outer world” and its skeptical evaluation can be demonstrated through reflections on film. Here film theory maintains a strong contact with philosophy. The distinction between appearance (that is, dream and poiesis) and reality has been on the agenda of film theory for almost eighty years. The “reality and dream” problem is not limited to the subjectivist approach that perceives film as a manifestation of fantasies and hallucinations. However “realists” like André Bazin have classified film as real, because film is able to capture an authentic reality independent of human subjectivity (see below). Comparisons of films and dreams can reveal new concepts of space and time because dreams seem to take place in an intermediary domain of abstractness and concreteness. Film is not, according to Amédée Ayfre, a thesis about the world; rather it presents the world. Any abstractly existential stance contained in this presentation makes film a philosophical phenomenon. Psychoanalysis represents another approach towards dreams and has a status within the philosophy of film which will be explained below.

a. Continental vs. Analytical

Analytical philosophy of film has been unwilling to identify psychoanalytical elements and some sociological elements, in particular approaches of critical theory or ideology critique, as “philosophical” because it deems that this theory does not satisfy more scientific standards. While a continental film scholar like Christian Metz would find the results of the French school of filmology relevant for the most scientific forms of experimental psychology, analytical philosophy usually rejects continental models based on language. These models are usually derived from the Saussurean model of signification and are present in poetics, semiotics or Lacanian psychology. Instead analytical philosophy  favors either cognition-based models or more “classical” questions related to problems such as the ontology of film, analyses of movement, realism, the nature of filmic representation, and explanations of our emotional engagement with fiction. Further, there is in analytical philosophy a strong desire to limit work on the philosophy of film from critical theory and cultural studies practiced in English departments. This problem never occurred in the more eclectic and naturally open field of continental philosophy of film.

Still, in many cases, the distinction between continental and analytical is not easy and does not always pass smoothly along the lines of a European and an American tradition. Although David Bordwell is a cognitive philosopher,  initially he was inspired by Russian formalist terminology and was himself a subject of interest for European semioticians. Though he is one of the most scathing critics of the continental paradigm in film theory (together with Carroll he coined the term “SLAB theory” to refer to theories that use the ideas of Saussure, Lacan, Althusser, and Barthes) (Bordwell & Carroll 1996), his early work is “structuralist” or “Foucaultian” in spirit as it analyzes the rules governing the practice of institutional film criticism/theory.

b. French Philosophy of Film

French philosophy has played an outstanding role in the development of a philosophy of film. Henri Bergson was the first philosopher who adopted film as a conceptual model for philosophical thought. Cinema helped him to imagine the distinction between spatialized time and duration, an idea that would remain essential for his entire philosophy. Though Bergson’s ideas bear no relation with the more contemporary language-based models of reason (and his interpreter Gilles Deleuze never used them in that way), Bergson’s thought fused with the remaining field of French philosophy of cinema in an often paradoxical fashion. Though French philosophy of film is composed of diverse elements, French or even continental philosophy of film can appear as amazingly coherent. Deleuze’s Bergsonian concept of the “time-image,” for example, is very much compatible with ideas elaborated by the Russian director Andrei Tarkovsky who derived his insights not from Bergson, but from a critical evaluation of Russian formalist film theory.

In 1946, Gilbert Cohen Séat published the first monograph on the philosophy of film (Essai sur les principes d’une philosophie du film). Jean Epstein’s L’Intelligence d’une machine, a truly philosophical book on film, appeared in the same year. In 1948, the interdisciplinary Parisian École de Filmologie began approaching film from a sociological, psychological, and philosophical angle. Filmology can be considered as a precursor of the semiology of cinema.

In the 1960’s and 1970’s, many principal theoretical discussions (such as auteur theory and genre theory) were developed in the Parisian journal Les Cahiers du cinéma, co-founded in 1951 by André Bazin. It was in this journal that French philosophy of film began to produce its characteristic mixtures of structuralism, semiotics, psychoanalysis, and Marxism. Paradoxically, the affiliation of filmology with semiotics and psychology – provocative as it might have seemed – provided the philosophy of film access to academia in the 1960’s. For European state-financed universities, film studies could never have been the economic boon as they have been in the United States. French philosophy departments remain resistant in the 21st century and permit the teaching of the philosophy of film only in institutions that are considered off the mainstream or within the newly founded – relatively small – discipline of aesthetics. While the “sociological temptation” exists, overall, French philosophy of film has remained very distinct from the sociology of cinema.

c. Philosophy of Film in Other European Countries

French philosophy of film is a unique phenomenon; no other European country has produced a similarly philosophical output on film. In Italy, Umberto Eco and Pier Paolo Pasolini published writings on film in the 1960s that would quickly be integrated into the French discourse. In Germany, the journal Filmkritik (launched in 1957), was the German equivalent of the Cahiers du cinema, though earlier writings by Frankfurt School members Siegfried Kracauer and Walter Benjamin turned out to be most compatible with French philosophy of film. Different from French and American postwar developments, in Germany, film studies never became institutionalized nor have they developed a consistent link with the praxis of film. German Filmwissenschaft (filmology) – most prominently represented by Thomas Elsaesser – developed along the lines of comparative literature, theater science, and art history rather than plunge into an adventurous speculative discourse. It would be absorbed into academia through the disciplines of Media- and Communication Science. The activities of Filmwissenschaft are diverse though its dominant tendency may be characterized as sociological whereas systematical film analysis is highly empirical. Aestheticians working in German philosophy departments (where the main tendency is analytical) continue the philosophical considerations of film, though hermeneutic film analysis has had some impact.

2. An Overview Of Theories

a. Henri Bergson

In the early 1900’s, Henri Bergson (1859-1941) developed the concepts of “movement-image” and “time-image” (in Matière et memoire), both of which anticipated the development of film theory. Bergson declares the image to be superior to the concept because the image is able to evoke thought content in a more fluent and less abstract fashion. In lectures held at the College de France between 1902-03, Bergson briefly refers to the possibility of “comparing the mechanism of conceptual thought with that of the cinematograph” (now in L’Evolution créatrice, 1991, p. 725, note 1). Bergson’s main philosophical theme is that temporality should be thought of as  independent from concepts of spatiality. Bergson contrasts duration, as it is experienced by the human consciousness, with scientific definitions of time, the latter of which, in his view, tends to “spatialize” time. Ironically, Bergson would later reject any possibility of using film as an exemplification of his ideas, in an essay entitled “The Cinematographic Illusion” (also in L’Evolution créatrice). Subsequent developments of Bergson’s ideas on duration by Epstein, Sartre, or Deleuze go, strictly speaking, against the grain of his original thought on cinema.

b. Hugo Münsterberg

The German-American philosopher and psychologist Hugo Münsterberg (1863-1916) wrote the first book on the philosophy of film entitled Photoplay: A Psychological Study (1916, German: Das Lichtspiel: eine psychologische Studie, 1916). Active during the silent film era, Münsterberg attempted to establish cinema as an art form that is different from theater or photography. Coming to America at the age of thirty-four, Münsterberg had clearly been under Neo-Kantian influence in Germany. Photoplay is divided into two parts, the first of which is inspired by experimental psychology dealing with the mental functions of the spectator. This first part is a precursor to the cognitive theory of film. The second part bears clear traits of Neo-Kantian aesthetics as it analyzes, in a formalist fashion, film’s form and function. The Neo-Kantian input became obvious through Münsterberg’s conviction that film is the mirror of the mind and not that of the world; the goal of cinema is not to reproduce reality, but to materialize emotions. Münsterberg theorized about how close-ups and flashbacks parallel acts of consciousness (that is affect, memory) and formulated the ‘film/mind’ analogy that was much explored and criticized by other philosophers (for example Carroll, 1988b).

c. Formalist Approaches

i. The Russian Formalism Tradition

Russian Formalism designates a school of innovative linguists and literary critics. It developed out of modernist movements such as Russian symbolism and constructivism. From 1915 to 1930, both the Moscow group (led by Roman Jakobson) and the St. Petersburg Society for the Study of Poetical Language (OPOJAZ), which included notorious members like Viktor Shklovsky, Osip Brik, Boris Eikhenbaum, and Vladimir Propp, applied newly invented formalist linguistic methods to the study of literature and poetry. Rediscovered in the West in the 1960’s, the work of the Russian Formalists has had an important influence on structuralist theories of literature, and on some of the more recent varieties of Marxist literary criticism.

Several Russian Formalists wrote on film mainly by establishing analogies between film and language. The idea to interpret film as language goes back, among other things, to Shklovsky’s reaction to the writings of the Ukrainian linguist Alexander Potebnja (1836-1891) who thought of poetry as “thinking in images.” According to Shklovsky, this leads to the false assumption that the creation of symbols is the main cognitive occupation. Shklovsky suggested seeing the activity of thinking as a more abstract and relational way of thinking. This model of thinking comes close to a formalist idea of film. Finally, all artistic activ­ity should be seen as a creative reorganization of pre-aesthetic materials: art need not express new content but should make a strange habitualized form.

For formalism, cinematic time (or cinematic reality altogether) is incompatible with naturalist representations. It is not staged, nor does the director transfer reality on the screen by means of intuition (as does, for example, impressionist painting). For the formalists, time is created through montage. Technical terms such as ‘defamiliarization’ (ostranenie) or the ‘story’ (fabula) as opposed to the ‘plot’ (sjuzhet), have become important in Western European and American film studies. Both Christian Metz (1975) and David Bordwell (1985) borrowed heavily from formalism.

1. Sergei Eisenstein

The director Sergei Mikhailovich Eisenstein remains a central figure in formalist film theory and by helping to develop the above idea of time created through montage. One of Eisenstein’s aims was to overcome, in a formalist fashion, “intuitive creativity” through “rational constructive composi­tion of effective elements” (1988a, I, p. 175). Eisenstein designated artistic activity as the process of organizing raw material. A large part of this cinematic theory is based on a principle similar to what Russian Formalists called ostranenie (alien­ation, estrangement, German: Verfremdung). According to Eisen­stein, within every shot there is a conflict between an object and its spatial nature or between an event and its temporal nature. As a consequence of this conflict, cine­matic time does not exist as “real time,” but must be experienced as an artistic-technical device. For Eisenstein, montage will never produce a “rhythm” or regularly patterned series of shots because such series would still rely too much on “artistic feeling” or empathy.

Eisenstein was the first person who attempted to see cinema as a thinking process. Recognizing that film reconstructs the actions of the human mind, Eisenstein perceived montage form as “a reconstruction of the laws of the thought process” (1988c, p. 236). His theory of dialectical montage (directly referring to Hegel and Marx) suggests that a third idea can emerge from the presentation of two conflicting shots. Related to this is his concept of “shock to thought” which occurs when the conflict between two shots forces us to think its synthesis (1988b, p. 45). Deleuze takes this idea up in Image-Temps and explains that this shock forces thinking to think itself as well as to think the whole (p. 207). Another famous concept is Eisenstein’s idea of cinema as a revolutionary ‘kino-fist’ formulated in reaction against his rival Dziga Vertov’s Kino Eye group (see below). It is difficult to summarize the entire body of Eisenstein’s writings as they teem with unpredictable insights and can certainly not be reduced to formalist recipes towards technicality.

2. Vsevolod Pudovkin

Vsevolod Illarionovitch Pudovkin (1893-1953) elaborated in the late 1920s and early 1930s on a theory of film based on narrative and spatiotemporal continuity. In Kinorezhisser i kinomaterial (1926), Kinoszenarii: Teoria szenarija (1926), and Akter v fil’me (1934) (published in English as Film Technique and Film Acting), Pudovkin examines such devices as contrast, parallelism, and symbolism. Several of Pudovkin’s formulations influenced Rudolf Arnheim (see below).

3. Lev Kuleshov

The idea that editing constitutes the “essence” of film art originated with the Russian director and theoretician Lev Kuleshov (1899-1970) who experimented with montage in the 1920s in an almost scientific fashion and is also one of the key exponents of the ‘film as language’ idea. Thoughts on montage are expressed as early as 1920 in his study “The Banner of Cinematography” (Engl. in Selected Works, 1987, Moscow). Kuleshov was able to show with the help of experiments that an isolated shot has no meaning (the famous Kuleshov effect).

4. Yuri Lotman

The Russo-Estonian semiotician Yuri Mikhailovitch Lotman (1922-1993) set out to reformulate the Saussurean notion of the sign by establishing a relationship of necessity between the signified and the signifier (which Saussure believed to be arbitrary). Lotman was the main proponent of the Tartu-Moscow School and his work is directly linked to the Russian Formalist tradition. He is perhaps most noted for the coinage of the term “semiosphere.” In his Semiotika kino i problemy kinoestetiki (1973) (Semiotics of Cinema), Lotman distinguished between the different levels of illusion and reality in film by analyzing the cinematic shot, narration, as well as the ideological function of cinema as mass-media. His distinction between pictorial/iconic signs used in the visual arts and conventional signs (words, letters) as used in literature had a central position in his work. Lotman also insisted that the cinematic language of a film is always related to exterior cultural codes.

ii. Béla Balász: Film as Language

Béla Balász (1949-1984) was a Hungarian film aesthetician who wrote in Hungarian and German. His books, Der sichtbare Mensch (The Visible Man, 1924) and Der Geist des Films (The Spirit of Film, 1930) were the first theoretical books on film after Münsterberg’s Photoplay. They remain the founding stones of modern film theory though they have been translated into English only in 2010. Balász’s book Theory of the Film (Hungarian, 1948, English 1953) picked up threads from the earlier books and brought him posthumous international fame. In general, Balász strove to offer to modern man possibilities of overcoming his particular state of estrangement by designing a utopian visual culture in which film plays an essential role. Balász’s ambition to describe film as a language brought him close to the Russian Formalists; he was actually able to advance views on montage that would be too mechanistic even for Eisenstein’s standards. However, a genuinely philosophical component enters his work through complex reflections on cinematic “reality.” In Theory of the Film, Balász wrote: “Although objective reality is independent of the subject and his subjective consciousness, beauty is not merely objective reality, not an attribute of the object entirely independent of the spectator, not something that would be there objectively even without a corresponding subject even if there were no human beings on earth” (p. 33). Malcolm Turvey classifies Balász (together with Jean Epstein, Dziga Vertov, and Siegfried Kracauer) as a “revelationist” because for all these theorists, the cinema is a means of enlightenment: it escapes the limits of human sight and reveals the true nature of reality. To some extent, the particular way of tackling the reality problem in film was determined by Balász’s interest in dreams. Two of Balász’s prose works are entitled Youth of a Dreamer and Fairytale, Ritual, and Film, the latter of which testified to his interest in film as “otherworldliness.” Without giving in to mystification and decidedly refusing fades or dissolves, Balász remained fascinated by film’s “ability to transform all things in space into bearers of expressions” and interpreted some original scenes psychoanalytically, such as substantial dream images (cf. Loewi, p. 318).

iii. Mikhail Bakhtin: Dialogicity and Reception

The ‘Bakhtin School’ theorists Mikhail M. Bakhtin, Pavel N. Medvedev, and Valentin N. Voloshinov developed elements of formalism by emphasizing the dialogical and polyphonic character of texts and cultural phenomena. Though the Bakhtin School did not write explicitly on film, it should be mentioned here for two reasons. First, Mikhail Bakhtin’s (1895-1975) writings had indirect influence on the film semiotics of Julia Kristeva and Tzvetan Todorov. Bakhtinian concepts of dialogism and polyphony are crucial because they can help to address fundamental questions about film form and reception. Second, film is an extremely good example for polyphony. While in the novel we most typically encounter the monologic narrator, in the film, the narrative, the character’s appearance, the dialogues, and several other elements appear simultaneously within one time frame (cf. Vice, p. 142). Also, Bakhtin’s central notion of the chronotope exemplifies the fusion of time and space that is typical for film.

iv. Rationalism: Galvano Della Volpe

The Italian Marxist philosopher Galvano Della Volpe (1895-1968), who in 1954 published a book called Il verosimile filmico e altri scritti di estetica, designed a rational aesthetics of film emphasizing unity, coherence, and harmony. Della Volpe formulated an organic theory of literature affirming the rational instead of the sentimental value of the work of art. Art is not distinct from science because both are based on the unity of the concept (in Critica del gusto). Central is Della Volpe’s critique of Crocean idealism, but also of materialism. Della Volpe established an epistemology of art that voluntarily remains indifferent towards social contexts or contents and excels in the analysis of technical, structural or formal processes in art. Della Volpe drew greatly from Aristotle’s Poetics. Emphasizing the analysis of formal aspects, Della Volpe pointed out film’s capacity to present the world symbolically as well as its ability to express abstract concepts. The latter happened for him mainly through montage. Similar to Jean Mitry, Della Volpe criticized the reduction of film to language; furthermore he was inspired by Pudovkin’s distinction between ‘plasticity’ and ‘concreteness’ of filmic images. Finally, Della Volpe established cinematic verisimilitude as non-equivalent to reality.

v. Semiotics/Semiology

Semiotics is the study of signs and symbols and examines how meaning is created and communicated through signifying processes. In France, the term sémiologie is more often used than the term sémiotique, though there does not seem to be a clear distinction between the terms. The discipline of semiology goes back to Ferdinand de Saussure whereas semiotics was founded by Charles Sanders Peirce, who was later taken up by Deleuze (rather than Saussure).

1. Gilbert Cohen-Séat

In 1946, Gilbert Cohen-Séat published the first monograph on film which bears the word “philosophy” in its title (Essai sur les principes d’une philosophie du film). The Revue internationale de filmologie was founded soon afterwards and Cohen-Séat’s name remains linked to filmology. Arguably, his most important contribution to film studies was the distinction between “filmic facts” and “cinematic facts”: “The filmic fact consists of the expression of life (the life of the world, the spirit, the imagination, of beings and things) through a system of combined images (visual-natural or conventional- and auditory-sounds and words). The cinematic fact, instead, consists of social circulation of sensations, ideas, feelings, and materials that come from life itself and that cinema shapes according to its desires,” (Essai…, p. 57). Cohen-Séat’s scientific approach made him a precursor of the semiotics of cinema.

2. Roland Barthes

Roland Barthes’ influence on film theory is similar to that of the Bakhtin school. Though having written almost nothing on film, his narratology that strives to see theatre, photography, and music as texts has deeply influenced our ways of seeing film as the interplay of voices or codes. Paradoxically, this thinker who mused so much about “floating signifiers,” found very disturbing the fact that in films, signifiers are in motion: “The filmic, very paradoxically, cannot be grasped in the film ‘in situation’, ‘in movement’, in its natural state’, but only in that major artifact, the still” (1977, p. 65).

3. Christian Metz

Christian Metz (1931–1994) was the initiator of a film analysis that relies in the most outspoken way on semiotics and is, like Barthes, what the French call a “sémiologue.” In general, Metz’s approach towards cinema has become the prototypical example of a quasi-scientific form of film theory. Apart from linguistic structuralism, Metz borrowed from psychoanalysis, in particular from Jacques Lacan and his writings on the mechanisms of dreams and voyeurism. This allowed him to explain perceptual phenomena of the filmic narrative from the point of view of the perceiving subject and take into consideration the unconscious processes of desire that allegedly position the spectator ideologically. Metz is particularly renowned for his “grand synagmatics” (grande syntagmatique) through which he categorized the most frequent codes and signifying units (called ‘syntagmes’) in cinema. Metz established the single shot as the smallest unit and the entire film as the largest one. He classified all syntagmes in distinct categories, distinguishing, for example, between chronological and a-chronological syntagmes.

According to Metz, cinematic language (langage) is not constituted by all elements that appear in a film, but only by those things that can only appear in film. Film analysis should highlight only those signifying figures that are truly cinematographic. Metz questioned Eisenstein’s vision of cinema as a langue because a langue is a highly organized code, whereas language covers a much broader area. Film should not be seen as langue because cinematic signs are reinvented or are updated in every film (Essais sur la signification, p. 47). Some might find Metz’s approach anti-philosophical because it so vehemently denies the possibility of phenomenological considerations. On the other hand, Metz’s work can be considered as philosophical because it deals with ethical implications (employing Marxist themes) and it extensively discusses the matter of reality and of dreams through a Freudian perspective.

4. Pier Paolo Pasolini

Pier Paolo Pasolini (1922-1975) was, and remains, a relatively little known as a theorist in the United States, but he held a central position in European film theory. Under the influence of Barthes, Metz, and Gramsci, Pasolini’s essays on cinema collected in the book Empirismo Eretico (1972) are exercises in semiotics that raised, in the 1960’s, a debate involving Umberto Eco (1967) and Metz (1968). When Pasolini postulated that cinema is the “written language of reality,” he was not intending to establish cinematic reality as a sort of cinematic language, nor is he preaching realism. Pasolini wants to conceive the real as cinematic. Reality is the discourse of things that cinema re-narrates. This project is highly philosophical and, famously, in 1967 Pasolini remarked, in the Journal of the Communist Party, that “semiotics has not taken the step which would lead it to become a Philosophy.”

d. Cinematographic Ontology and Phenomenology

i. Phenomenology

Phenomenology is a philosophy that goes back to Edmund Husserl and takes as a point of departure a sort of “experience” that is strictly designed as the sensible intuition of phenomena. On the basis of this prescription, phenomenology attempts to understand the essence of what is experienced. Martin Heidegger, though influenced by Husserl, interpreted phenomenology as an ontology, that is, as a discipline attempting to understand the Being of ourselves as Dasein (existence) and preparing for an understanding of the meaning of Being as such. His version is called “existential phenomenology.” Both Husserl’s and Heidegger’s phenomenology remain critical towards metaphysics. In the philosophy of film, the phenomenological, “synthetic” approach has often been opposed to the “analytical,” semiotic one.

1. Maurice Merleau-Ponty

Like Bergson, Merleau-Ponty (1908-1961) criticized all attempts of representing the world in a purely scientific fashion as reductive. In film, the meaning of an image depends on the preceding image and their succession creates a new reality. Merleau-Ponty has had a considerable influence on Cohen-Séat (see Andrew 1978: p. 46). In 1945, Merleau-Ponty devoted a lecture to the possibilities of phenomenological interpretations of cinema (“Le cinéma et la nouvelle psychologie” in Sens et non-sens) where he depicted film not as a sum of images, but as a temporal phenomenon. The central term in Merleau-Ponty’s musings on film is the idea of immersion. For the phenomenologist, humans are thrown into a life world to which they remain attached in the most natural and inconspicuous way. Film provides a phenomenological experience par excellence because in the cinema the human consciousness is consistently immersed in a world. Merleau-Ponty’s ideas never developed into a phenomenological theory of film, but have inspired theorists of Neo-Realism, such as Ayfre and Bazin and have been developed by Vivian Sobchack (1992).

2. Amédée Ayfre

Amédée Ayfre (1895-1963), a student of Merleau-Ponty, rejected formalist components such as style as essential characteristics of cinema and attempted to establish a “phenomenological realism” (Ayfre, 1964: 214) in film studies. In his Conversion aux images (written together with Henri Agel) Ayfre explicitly referred to the phenomenological ambition of strictly adhering to mere descriptions of experience without being influenced by either scientific or psychological considerations of causes (pp. 212-13). Ayfre’s notion of écriture as it appears in the cinéma d’auteur, designated “neither a content nor a style” (1969, p. 162), but attempted to go beyond the division of film into form and content. Phenomenologi­cal existence transgresses constructive devices as well as stylization and Ayfre’s sympathies clearly went towards Neo-Realist cinema (see below). As a Jesuit priest, Ayfre strove to reconcile his existentially-minded phenomenology with his Catholicism. Ayfre’s phenomenological realism is meant to depict a “spiritual” reality and not just a “real” one; it creates an illusion due to a “prodigious asceticism of means.” Ayfre’s concept of realism is diametrically opposed to formalist ideas about “realistic” narrative modes. David Bordwell, for example, believed that realistic expressions can be grasped best through norms and codes which vary according to different criteria, but remain formalizable in the last instance. “Realistic” motivations will be applied according to what the given narrative mode defines as realistic. For Bordwell, “verisimilitude in a classical narrative film is quite different from verisimilitude in the art cinema” (Narration in the Fiction Film, 1985, pp. 153-54). Ayfre, on the other hand, saw cinematic reality as the internal logic of a universe created by the director. Ayfre’s realism was also opposed to psychological interpretations because the reality we encounter in a film is more than merely the subconscious emanation or the reverie of a director. Ayfre’s younger collaborator Henri Agel (1911-2008) pursued a long publishing career and never abandoned the initial tendency, defining himself until the end as a “humanist and a spiritualist”.

ii. Realism:

Realism attempts to recreate life in art by relying on realistic presentation while minimizing controlling devices in the process of artistic production. In literature, realism has been developed by Balzac, Flaubert, and Zola. In film, Italian Neo-Realism is the most important realist movement.

1. André Bazin

The establishment of neo-realist film theory was mainly been the task of André Bazin (1918-1958) and Ayfre. Bazin’s realism was similar to Ayfre’s phenomenological realism, more so since he accepted Merleau-Ponty’s idea of reality as “the pure appearance of everything that is in the world” (“la pure apparence des êtres au monde” (Questions IV, p. 62). In 1957, Bazin openly adopted Ayfre’s expression “phenomenological realism” in order to label the kind of films in which “reality is not modified according to psychological functions or dramatic requirements” (Questions IV, p. 138). Dudley Andrew writes that “Bazin saw in realism a kind of style which reduced signification to a minimum. In other words, he saw the rejection of style as a potential stylistic option” (Andrew, 1976, p. 143).

Together with Alexandre Astruc, Bazin was also responsible for the so-called “auteur theory,” which grew mainly out of the two writers’ works and since has been central for French New Wave cinema. François Truffaut and other Cahiers authors joined later on, as well as Andrew Sarris in the USA. Bazin’s realism had a metaphysically significant backdrop. Like Ayfre’s phenomenological realism, Bazin’s phenomenological ontology was strongly marked by religious convictions. Sometimes terms like “real presence” or “revelation of reality” appear to have almost religious connotations. In this sense, Bazin’s philosophy was essentialist, in spite of the existentialist stances to which he was submitted. Bazin remains one of the most anti-formalist theoreticians. In his opinion, neo-realist films “aim to reduce montage to zero and to transport to the screen reality in its continuity” (p. 146).

2. Siegfried Kracauer

Siegfried Kracauer’s (1889-1966) writings on film were based on sociology and psychology. His conviction that film has a realist character made him a main proponent of cinematic realism and brought him close to Bazin (whom he never mentions). Kracauer based his realism on the resemblance that he perceived between film and photography. For post-surrealists critics such as Bazin and Kracauer, cinema should look for its genuine expression within a kind of realist expression that can be described as the exact opposite of the surrealist cinema of dreams and symbolisms. Interestingly, in the end, Kracauer defined an alternative form of dreamlike realism able to transmit reality “as if it were a dream”. In his Theory of Film he wrote: “Perhaps films look most like dreams when they overwhelm us with the crude and unnegotiated presence of natural objects—as if the camera had just now extricated them from the womb of physical existence and as if the umbilical cord between image and actuality had not yet been severed. There is something in the abrupt immediacy and shocking veracity of such pictures that justifies their identification as dream images” (p. 224).

Like Ayfre, Kracauer was opposed to any stylization of reality: the realistic character of dream elements is compared to those objects that we can find in nature. Kracauer’s realism was not based on calculations with possibilities of literal reproductions, but on the director’s ability to capture a certain spiritual quantity that is supposed to be enclosed to reality. Ayfre’s phenomenological realism, which strove to depict a “spiritual” reality, and not just a “real” one is echoed by Kracauer’s distinction between “photographic reality” and “camera reality” (Theory of Film, p. 150). For Kracauer, it was important that the “the form giving tendency does not rise above the realistic one” (p. 67). Ayfre, Bazin, and Kracauer engaged in paradoxical projects: Ayfre attempted to apply an aesthetic asceti­cism on reality without applying stylization; Bazin attempted to retrieve style by rejecting style; Kracauer attempted to establish a paradoxical balance between realistic and formalizing tendencies.

3. Dziga Vertov

Dziga Vertov’s theory of the “cinema of fact” can be considered a form of cinematic realism. In 1919, Vertov founded the group Kino-oki (“cinema-eyes”) insisting, in various manifestos, that the cinema of the future will not be that of stars and of fiction, but a cinema of facts. Vertov developed a concept of cinema as “life caught in awareness,” in which the camera eye innocently captures reality “as it is” without stylizing it. This clearly joins the ambitions of the neo-realists. The Russian director Andrei Tarkovsky, who was strongly influenced by Vertov and by Russian “Documentary Aesthetics” in the 1960’s, has indeed been likened to Bazin and neo-realism. Jon Beasley-Murray points out that Tarkovsky restored the “actuality of time” by constructing a subjectivity by which this reality is inhabited (1997, p. 47).

iii. Existentialism

1. Alexandre Astruc’s Caméra-Stylo

A disciple of Bazin, Alexandre Astruc (1923-) established in his essay “La Caméra-stylo” (1948) an aesthetics of cinema that based its expressions on the idea of writing rather than on conventional conceptions of the image. The language of film can be shaped until it becomes as subtle as the language of literature. Cinema is not a consecution of images. Instead, it adopts more abstract characteristics because it is able to integrate abstraction in itself. Abstraction is no longer present as an underlying structure of the film (as is the case with montage), but it expresses itself directly: “By language I mean a form in which and by which an artist can express his thoughts, however abstract they may be, or translate his obsessions exactly as he does in the contemporary essay or novel. That is what I would like to call this new age of cinema, the age of caméra-stylo” (Astruc, 1968, p. 18).

Like Bazin’s and Kracauer’s, Astruc’s strategy is directed against surrealist cinema. But it is also directed against conventional documentaries because the caméra-stylo intends to grasp “any kind of reality.” In a film “recorded” by a caméra-stylo there is no evocation of subjective, intimate symbols; nothing has been produced by the artist through the direct transposition of an inner reality; nor is there is any objective recording of reality. Film is not a documentation undertaken from a detached point of view located outside the things filmed. This is why the camera works like a pen: it records concrete reality, but then transforms it instantly into an abstraction. A caméra-stylo can produce an “écriture,” but it would be too simple to say that a film is transformed into literature only because the camera is transformed, in a metaphori­cal way, into a pen. The use of the camera as a pen has more to do with the interplay of realization and abstraction or, to use another term, of stylization. In other words, the writing camera produces style. This makes Astruc’s theory different from “anti-stylization” movements such as realism and (to some extent) phenomenology. However, it is important to understand that the caméra-stylo philosophy does not preach formalist stylization, but attempts to capture style, which makes it, paradoxically, compatible with some realist and phenomenological stances. Marcel Martin goes as far as saying that the “new language” which cinema has discovered makes sense as long as style turns out to be the main protagonist of this medium. “The real main character of this cinema is thus the style (…). The ‘poetic cinema’ (cinéma de poésie) is thus essentially founded on the exercise of style as inspiration” (Martin, 1967, p. 68).

iv. Film as Thought

Jacques Aumont, in A quoi pensent les films?, insists that “film has the power of thinking”. In the introduction of this article, the idea to see film as a form of thinking has been addressed as an important part of the philosophy of film that begins with Eisenstein.

1. Jean Epstein: Film as Artificial Intelligence

The avant-garde director Jean Epstein (1897-1953) remains better known for his theoretical writings than for his films, many of which are no longer extant. Together with Eisenstein, Epstein is a precursor of “cinema as thought” theories. Mixing Eisenstein’s thoughts with Marxism and the intellectual potential flowing out of the French Impressionist School of Film active during the 1920’s, Epstein designs a philosophy that is more reminiscent of Bergson than of formalism and can even be called anti-semiotic. Film is much more than a text or a writing; it is a machine able to produce a dreamlike reality by unhinging the most basic rules of logic and time, and by overcoming human reason.

In his major work L’Intelligence d’une machine (1921), Epstein discovered that cinema as a thinking machine is able to liberate us from the constraints of logic in order to produce a poetic and dreamlike reality. Cinema manipulates space and time. Comparing film with the microscope, it seems that Epstein anticipated contemporary computer reality or virtual reality. Cinema is a “robot brain” (p. 71) able to transcend the physical and mental limits of humans. The cinematograph, like the calculator, is the first materialization of “machines for thinking” (p. 48) and more complex ones will follow. Obviously inspired by Bergson, Epstein observes how cinema stretches and condenses duration and lets us feel the variable and relative nature of time. Cinema thinks time  is a “partial mechanical brain” that develops a “rich philosophy full of surprises” (p. 71). The reality that cinema thinks is “the sum of many irrealities”. For some, Epstein’s theory might smack a little too much of pseudo-science but he plausibly defines cinema as a “machine for producing dreams” (p. 55).

2. Jean Mitry

Some might remember Jean Mitry (1907-1988) as an “anti-semiologist” film thinker because of his harsh criticism of Christian Metz in La Sémiologie en question (1987). Still this theorist and film maker has his own semiotic past. In 1963, the publication of the two volumes of Esthétique et psychologie du cinéma was seen as a major event in the world of French cinema theory. The highly synthetic book deals with all thinkable subjects and accepts some of Bazin’s realism as well as several formalist patterns, but does not – though the title might suggest this – engage in Freudian psychoanalytical elaborations. Mitry’s method was that of perceptual psychology and his refusal of Bazin’s ambition to discover in cinema a “world beyond the world” is absolute. A philosophical input comes from another side. Mitry was asking himself if “filmic language does not reflect thought in the way in which it produces itself [‘en train de se faire’] much better than could do words (…) which only crystallize thoughts in the form of more or less independent ideas by translating a thought that is already achieved” (p. 90). It becomes clear here that Mitry working within the thread of those “Cinema as Thought” theorists presented in the present sub-chapter. Mitry found cinema to be unique in that it signifies only while functioning (p. 63). It is thus consistent that he reproaches, in La Sémiologie en Question, Christian Metz (his admirer) his reductive application of linguistics to film because the language of film is not based on words. Mitry’s position can be summarized as that of a phenomenology of perception and his work often proceeds synoptically with the precision of a historian.

3. Gilles Deleuze

Deleuze’s (1925-1995) analysis of cinema was founded on Bergson’s work Matière et memoire and C. S. Peirce’s taxonomy of signs. Deleuze’s engagement with both represents a rupture with the Saussureian linguistic semiotic tradition. Deleuze rejected “linguistic” as well as psychoanalytic models of film theorisation. Like Mitry, Deleuze believed that film, as it represents and reflects on time, is incompatible with language; for him, the pre-signifying ‘signaletic material’ that films are made of was not assimilable to models of semiotics. In this regard, Deleuze anticipated a number of analytic-cognitivist film theorists.

Similar to Epstein, Deleuze believed that film can alter our modes of thinking about movement and time. In a Bergsonian way, Deleuze put forward that cinematic experience was as a means to perceive time and movement as a whole. The starting point of Bergson’s philosophy was the distinction between temporal and spatial reality. Bergson modified the traditional relationship between unity and repetition by attributing singularity to time and discontinuity to space. Lived time and measured time should not be confused. Bergson’s thesis is that the human who looks at the clock perceives merely juxtapositions of different positions of the hand, which bear no link among themselves. Only the ‘I’ (consciousness) experiences a time whose essence is duration. Correspondingly, Deleuze held that in cinema, our mind does not need to put together the successive percepts or sensations it perceives; rather it receives them as a whole.

Deleuze seemed to be going back in time as he attempted to base his theory of cinema on a point before the semiotic tradition and even before Shklovsky’s formalism which strove to overcome Potebnja’s model of “thinking in images.” More precisely, Deleuze held that films do not think with simple images, but with movement-images and time-images. In his two monumental books on cinema, “Image-Mouvement” (Cinéma I) and “Image-Temps” (Cinéma II), Deleuze engaged the entire history of cinema in order to show a difference between these two types of images. Frequently, we encounter the movement-image, which is based on a sensory-motor scheme (it shows an action, which produces a reaction). In the movement-image, the action imposes itself upon time, it is the action which determines the duration of a scene and the next scene is a reaction to this action (see Deleuze 1984). The time-image, on the other hand, is based on pure thinking. The time-image emerged in cinema after WWII mainly with Italian Neo-Realism and French New Wave cinema. It does not follow the scheme of action-reaction, but it can evoke a time that is prior to movement. Time-images do not simply show us actions and movements, but different layers of time, all of which converge within single points of present. These images can express a present that constantly reaches for the past and for the future.

Deleuze brought film studies closer to philosophy. For Deleuze, film was superior to other arts because it combines time and movement in such a necessary fashion. More than that, cinema must be considered as a philosophy because it constructs its own “concepts.” Cinema is not an applied philosophy submitted to traditional philosophical concepts, but it develops “cinematic” concepts. It does not simply represent reality, but is in itself an ontological practice. Therefore cinema is more than simply an art. In this sense, Deleuze was doing neither film theory nor aesthetics, but he thinks of film as a philosophy. In Deleuze’s earlier writings, art is able to draw on concepts and therefore not confined to percepts or ‘blocs of sensation.’ However, even here Deleuze did not recommend extracting as many concepts as possible from cinema: “A theory of cinema is not about cinema but about the concepts sparked by cinema” (p. 365). Later, in What is Philosophy? (1991), Deleuze (and his co-writer Felix Guattari) reserved “concepts” for philosophy only and declared that cinema thinks with affects and precepts.

Cinema’s highest objective is nothing other than promoting thought and the functioning that comes from thinking. This is what makes cinema different from mere dreams which, in Deleuze’s view, are not thinking. Bad films do nothing more than induce a dream in the spectators (Image-temps, p. 219), they simply reiterate sensory-motor clichés that provoke neither thought or affect.

4. Filmosophy

More recently, Daniel Frampton has added a brick to the wall called “Film as Thought” by insisting that film does not narrate or show things, characters, or actions. Instead, it thinks them. When watching a film we observe a thinking process. In his book Filmosophy (2006) Frampton attempts to grasp this cinematic thinking process with the help of newly coined concepts such as ‘film-thinking’ and ‘filmind’ and assigns to ‘filmosophy’ the task of “conceptualizing all film as an organic intelligence” (p. 7). Film-thinking is not a metaphorical way of arranging reality, but “the filmind has its own particular film-phenomenology, its own way of attending to its world” (p. 91). There is a film-like way of thinking. Philosophers like Bachelard, for example, were able to produce “a flow that weaves discourses together, yet still with rigor and meaning” (p. 179). Although philosophers can learn from film-thinking, Frampton insists that “film has its own kind of thinking” (p. 23), that it “cannot show us human thinking, [but that] it shows us ‘film-thinking’” (p. 47). Thinking is radically removed from the activity of merely processing data.

v. Film as Poetic Art: Susanne Langer

Susanne Langer’s philosophy of film drew very much upon the analogy of film and dream. Langer was an American pragmatist philosopher close to the continental tradition. She was also a frequent reference point in analytic philosophy of film (for example, in Carroll). For Langer, cinema is an art that has introduced the “dream mode” as its main artistic expression, a mode that finally enables cinema to estab­lish itself as an independent medium. Still, film is not a daydream – which is but a wilful imitation of a dream. In her essay “A Note on Film,” Langer wrote: “[Film] is not any poetic art we have known before; it makes the primary illusion—virtual history—in its own mode. This is, essentially, the dream mode. I do not mean that it copies dream, or puts one into a daydream. Not at all, no more than literature invokes memory, or makes us believe that we are remember­ing’’ (p. 200).

e. Psychology/Psychoanalysis

Psychological film theory began with the publication of Münsterberg’s Photoplay, in which the first part is inspired by experimental psychology. In remainder of the twentieth century, more philosophical approaches would use psychoanalysis for the decoding of unconscious elements that were supposed to contain truth by reading films through schemes of symbolization and representation. These approaches are current in the continental tradition.

i. Rudolf Arnheim

Rudolf Arnheim (1904-2007) published Film als Kunst (Film as Art) in 1932, defending film as a form of art distinct from the productions of the entertainment industry. Historically, Arnheim’s main writings on film can be situated between Münsterberg and Balász. Later Arnheim founded a full-fledged aesthetics on the theory of perception and gestalt theory (especially in Art and Visual Perception, 1954). Comments on film are sparse in Arnheim’s later work, but the following quotation, which links film interpretation to Freudian psychology, is remarkable because it addresses a possible extension of the Freudian vision of dream into Arnheim’s own domain. In Visual Thinking (1969), Arnheim pointed to a fundamental link between film and dream that psychology should follow: “Freud raises the question of how the important logical links of reasoning can be repre­sented in images. An analogous problem, he says, exists for the visual arts. There are indeed parallels between dream images and those created in art on the one hand, and the mental images serving as the vehicle of thought on the other; but by noting the resemblance one also becomes aware of the differences, and these can help to characterize thought imagery more precisely” (p. 241).

1. Psychoanalysis vs. Cognitive Science

Reflections on the relationship between the spectator and the film have become particularly central in French film theory since the publication of Christian Metz’s Le signifiant imaginaire: psychoanalyse et cinéma (1977) and Metz’s Lacanian developments as well as the writings of Jean Louis Baudry. For psychoanalysis, the proximity between film and dream is essential because film interpretation is seen as a sort of Freudian dream interpretation. Almost half a century after Arnheim’s above remark, psychoanalytical film theory is still struggling to explain the ways in which unconscious elements obstruct the reception of films and to understand how films spark unconscious or irrational processes. This approach can be understood as diametrically opposed to that of cognitive science which is also interested in how spectators make sense of and respond to films, but which observes the viewer’s conscious processing of films.

ii. The Mindscreen Theory

Bruce F. Kawin began his book Mindscreen: Bergman and First-Person Film (1978) with the question: “Film is a dream—but whose?” (p. 3). Kawin claimed that dreamlike films are self-conscious artworks in which narrative voices have been “generalized” up to a point that we perceive the artworks themselves as if they appear on a “dream screen.” Kawin adopted the idea of the dream screen from the American Psycholo­gist Bertram D. Lewin (1950) whose ideas had, in their time, contributed in an outstanding way to an increasing interest in dreams in post-Freudian America. In an article entitled “Interferences from the Dream Screen,” Lewin declared: “In a previous communication, a special structure, the dream screen was distin­guished from the rest of the dream and defined as the blank background upon which the dream picture appears to be projected. The term was suggested by the action pictures because, like the analogue in the cinema, the dream screen is either not noted by the dreaming spectator, or it is ignored due to the interest in the pictures and actions that appear on it’’ (p. 104).

Kawin’s contribution to film theory consists of examining the validity of the dream screen (or mindscreen) in cinema providing clues to particularities of the narrative structure of film. In Bergman’s Persona, for example, there is “an impression of the mindscreen’s being generalized,” so that the film’s self-consciousness appears to originate from within. Being identified neither with a specific character nor with the filmmaker, the “potential linguistic focus” takes on the characteristics of a mindscreen: “The film becomes first-person, it speaks itself” (Kawin, pp. 113-14). Kawin anticipates Frampton’s ‘filmind’.

iii. Slavoj Žižek

Given his use of psychoanalysis and Marxism, the extremely influential Slovenian philosopher Slavoj Žižek (1949-) is a typical representative of continental film theory, the more so since he has explicitly opposed Anglo-American, empirical approaches (see “Introduction to 2001”). Žižek uses Lacanian concepts and insights (most importantly his notion of the Other) and works with concepts derived from the philosophies of Derrida and Deleuze, such as a decentralized notion of the subject. The value of his philosophy of film, developed in numerous books, seems to reside mainly in his consistent and original application of abstract theories to films though he has also submitted various concepts to original developments. His writings do not represent philosophy of film as such; rather they are attempts to read ideology by analyzing contemporary popular films.

f. Walter Benjamin and the Frankfurt School

Like Siegfried Kracauer, Walter Benjamin (1892-1940) belongs to the Frankfurt School of philosophy. Benjamin believed that the techniques of reproduction can be used for the reproduction of traditional works only, and also as new modes of representation. Benjamin’s theory of film is sometimes associated with that of cinematographic realism. Most famously, in his essay Das Kunstwerk im Zeitalter seiner technischen Reproduzierbarkeit [The Work of Art in the Age of Mechanical Reproduction] (1935), Benjamin interpreted modifications of the original through the process of reproduction, as a loss of the work’s aura.

Benjamin favored an allegorical kind of photography (that is definitely opposed to the art of montage), examples of which he found in early photography because it can be perceived something like an aura: “In the fleeting expression of a human face seen in early photographs, the aura shows itself for the last time. This is what makes their melan­cholic and thus incomparable beauty” (I, 2, p. 445). Like Epstein, Benjamin believed that cinema can provide us with extraordinary access to reality: the details that are produced by the close-up or the forms that are revealed by slow motion can “give us access to the experience of an optical unconscious just like psychoanalysis offers us the experience of the instinctive unconscious” (p. 460). In this sense, knowledge about the world is a matter of a sudden “awakening” to the world and this world can be a cinematic world.

Theodor W. Adorno (1903–1969), another member of the Frankfurt School, would transform Benjamin’s notion of “mass culture” into that of the “Kulturindustrie,” in which he saw as a systematized commodification encompassing ‘high’ and ‘mass’ art. This stands in contrast to Benjamin’s view of popular or mass culture as concealing a certain emancipatory potential to be unleashed by dialectical criticism. In their book Dialectic of Enlightenment (1972), Adorno and Max Horkheimer (1895–1973), developed a cultural critique that contains some dispersed but pertinent references to the culture industry of film excelling in standardized production techniques and catering for commercial and not for cultural purposes.

g. Hermeneutic Film Analysis

The hermeneutic approach is based on the interpretation of texts and detects the semantic potential of a text as well as its different levels of meanings. Hermeneutics can be seen as a branch of phenomenology and many of Ayfre’s and Agel’s texts bear traces of hermeneutic thinking. Still, in film analysis its method has mainly been developed in proximity with the interpretation of literature. Though hermeneutics of film explains the semiotic status of iconic signs, it never engages in the construction of semiotic systems because it is constantly aware of the historicity of any analysis. Today, hermeneutic film analysis is mainly practiced in German academic departments of Media and Communication Science. Moreover, such analysis has been brought to a point by Anke-Marie Lohmeier.

h. Future Perspectives

The future of continental philosophy of film will probably be developed in several areas. Žižek’s Lacanian approach, as long as it does not entirely enter the stream of cultural studies, will attract philosophers who deem that ideology should be the primary focus of cinema studies. Another area that might develop is the one pioneered by Bruce Kawin and Daniel Frampton, who provide a vocabulary for describing our aesthetic experience of film that transcends both Deleuze’s conceptual analyses of movement and time and phenomenological approaches. It clearly opens up philosophy to new ways of thinking. Equally promising is a whole range of “crossovers,” such as those that combine semiotic and cognitive paradigms of which Warren Buckland’s The Cognitive Semiotics of Film (2000) is an example. Other crossovers synthesize Deleuzian film theory and phenomenology (Shaw 2008), or the Cavellian-Wittgensteinian approach with continental philosophy (of which Stephen Mulhall is an example).

3. References and Further Reading

  • Agel, Henri. Esthétique du cinéma. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1957.
  • Aitken, Ian. European Film Theory and Cinema: A Critical Introduction. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2001.
  • Allen, Richard and Murray Smith. Film Theory and Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997.
  • Andrew, Dudley J. Major Film Theories: An Introduction. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1976.
  • Arnheim, Rudolf. Visual Thinking. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1969.
  • Astruc, Alexandre. “The Birth of a New Avant-Garde: La Caméra-Stylo,” in Graham, Peter, ed., The New Wave. London: Secker and Warburg, 1968.
  • Aumont, Jacques. A quoi pensent les films? Paris: Séguier, 1996.
  • Ayfre, Amédé. Conversion aux images? Paris: Cerf, 1964.
  • Ayfre, Amédé. Le Cinéma et sa vérité. Paris: Cerf, 1969.
  • Bakhtin, Mikhail. The Dialogic Imagina­tion. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1981.
  • Balász, Béla. Theory of the Film. New York: Arno Press, 1972.
  • Balázs, Béla. Early Film Theory: Visible Man and The Spirit of Film (trans. Rodney Livingstone, ed. by Erica Carter). New York: Berghahn, 2010.
  • Barthes, Roland. Image-Music-Text. New York: Hill and Wang, 1977.
  • Bazin, André. Qu’est-ce que le cinéma? Vol. I-IV. Paris: Cerf, 1985 [1958].
  • Beasley-Murray, Jon. “Whatever Happened to Neorealism? Bazin, Deleuze, and Tarkovsky’s Long Take,” in D.N. Rodowick, ed., Gilles Deleuze, philosophe du cinéma/Gilles Deleuze, philosopher of cinema, special issue of Iris 23 (Spring 1997), 37-52
  • Benjamin, Walter. Das Kunstwerk im Zeitalter seiner technischen Reproduzierbarkeit [1935] in Gesammelte Werke 1:2, ed. by R. Tiedemann and H. Schweppenhäuser. Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1980., p. 431-469. Engl.: The Work of Art in the Age of its Technological Reproducibility, and other Writings on Media. Boston: Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 2008.
  • Bergson, Henri. L’Evolution créatrice Paris: Alcan,1991 [1907].
  • Bergson, Henri. Matière et memoire. Paris: Presses universitaires françaises, 1939.
  • Bordwell, David and Noël Carroll, (ed.). Post-Theory: Reconstructing Film Studies. Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1996.
  • Bordwell, David. Narration in the Fiction Film. London: Methuen, 1985.
  • Branigan, Edward. Projecting a Camera: Language-Games in Film Theory. New York: Routledge, 2006.
  • Buckland, Warren. The Cognitive Semiotics of Film. Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Carroll, Noël. “Film/Mind Analogies: The Case of Hugo Munsterberg“ in Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 46:4, 188, pp. 489-499.
  • Carroll, Noël. Mystifying Movies: Fads and Fallacies in Contemporary Film Theory. New York: Columbia University Press, 1988.
  • Carroll, Noel. Philosophical Problems of Classical Film Theory. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988.
  • Carroll, Noël. Philosophical Problems of Classical Film Theory. Princeton University Press.
  • Casetti, Francesco. Theories of Cinema 1945-1995. Austin: Texas University Press, 1999.
  • Cohen-Séat, Gilbert. Essai sur les principes d’une philosophie de cinéma. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1958.
  • Curran, Angela & Thomas Wartenberg (eds.). The Philosophy of Film. London: Blackwell, 2005.
  • Davies, David. The Thin Red Line. London: Routledge, 2009.
  • Deleuze, Gilles & Felix Guattari. Qu’est-ce que la philosophie? Paris: Minuit, 1991. Engl.: What Is Philosophy? (trans. Tomlinson and G. Burchell) Columbia University Press, 1994.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Cours de G. Deleuze du 31/01/84, voir
  • Deleuze, Gilles. L’Image-mouvement. Cinéma 1. Paris: Minuit Paris, 1983.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. L’Image-temps. Cinéma 2. Paris: Minuit, 1985. Engl. transl. of both volumes: Cinema (trans. H. Tomlinson and B. Habberjam). Minneapolis : University of Minnesota Press, 1986-1989.
  • Della Volpe, Galvano. Il verosimile filmico e altri scritti di estetica. Rome: Filmcritica, 1954.
  • Eagle, Herbert. Russian Formalist Film Theory. Ann Arbor: Michigan Slavic Publica­tions, 1981.
  • Eco, Umberto. “Sulle articolazioni del codice cinematogra­fico” [1967] in Per una nuova critica. Venezia: Marsilio Editori, 1989, p.389-396.
  • Eisenstein, Sergei. 1988c. Selected Works 1: Writings 1922-34. London: BFI.
  • Eisenstein, Sergei. On Disney (trans. A. Upchurch). New York: Methuen, 1988b.
  • Eisenstein, Sergei. Writings. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1988a.
  • Epstein, Jean. L’Intelligence d’une machine. Paris: Jacques Melot, 1946.
  • Frampton, Daniel. Filmosophy. London, New York: Walflower, 2006.
  • Gaut, Berys. A Philosophy of Cinematic Art. Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Goodnow, Katherine J. Kristeva in Focus: From Theory to Film Analysis. Fertility, Reproduction & Sexuality. New York: Berghahn, 2010.
  • Kawin, Bruce F. Mindscreen: Bergman, Godard and First-Person Film. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1975.
  • Kracauer, Siegfried. Theorie des Films. Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1973. Engl.: Theory of Film: The Redemption of Physical Reality. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1960.
  • Langer, Susanne. “A Note on Film” in R. D. Maccann (ed.), Film: A Montage of Theories. New York: Dutton, 1966.
  • Lemon, L. and Reis, M. Russian Formalist Criticism: Four Essays. Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press, 1965.
  • Livingston, Paisley. Cinema, Philosophy, Bergman: On Film as Philosophy. Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Loewy, Hanno. Béla Balázs – Märchen, Ritual und Film. Berlin: Vorwerk 8, 2003.
  • Lohmeier, Anke-Marie. Hermeneutische Theorie des Films. Tübingen: Niemeyer, 1996.
  • Lotman, Yuri. Semiotika kino i problemy kinoestetiki. Tallinn: Eesti Raamat 1973. Engl.: Semiotics of Cinema (Michigan Slavic Contributions 5.) Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 1976.
  • Martin, Marcel. “Ingmar Bergman’s Persona” in Cinema, 119, 1967.
  • Merleau-Ponty, Maurice. Sens et non-sens. Paris: Nagel, 1948.
  • Metz, Christian. “Le signifiant imaginaire” in Communications 23, pp. 3-55, 1975.
  • Metz, Christian. “Fiction Film and its Spectator: A Metaphysical Study” in New Literary History 8:1, 1976.
  • Metz, Christian. Essais sur la Signification au Cinéma, Vol. I. Paris: Klincksieck, 1968.
  • Metz, Christian. Psychoanalysis and Cinema: The Imaginary Signifier. London: Macmillian, 1983.
  • Mitry, Jean. Esthétique et psychologie du cinéma, 2 Vol. Paris: Éditions Universitaires, 1963. Engl.: The Aesthetics and Psychology of the Cinema. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2000.
  • Mitry, Jean. La Sémiologie en Question. Paris : Cerf, 1987.
  • Mulhall, Stephen. On Film: Thinking in Action. London: Routledge, 2002.
  • Peirce, C. S. Peirce on Signs: Writings on Semiotic (ed. James Hoopes). Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina, 1994.
  • Polan, Dana B. “Roland Barthes and the Moving Image” in October 18, 1981, 41-46.
  • Pudovkin, Vsevolod. Film Technique and Film Acting. New York: Bonanza Books, 1949.
  • Rancière, Jacques, La Fable cinématographique. Paris: Le Seuil, 2001.
  • Rancière, Jacques, Le Destin des images. Paris: La Fabrique, 2003. Engl.: The Future of the Image. London: Verso, 2007.
  • Rancière, Jacques, Le Spectateur émancipé. Paris: La Fabrique, 2008. Engl.: The Emancipated Spectator. London: Verso, 2010.
  • Read, Rupert and Jerry Goodenough (eds.). Film as Philosophy: Essays on Cinema after Wittgenstein and Cavell. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2005.
  • Rushton, Richard & Gary Bettinson. 2010. What is Film Theory? London: Open University Press.
  • Russell, Bruce. “The Philosophical Limits of Film” in Film and Philosophy, Special Edition, 2000, pp. 163-167.
  • Shaw, Daniel. Film and Philosophy: Taking Movies Seriously. London: Wallflower Press, 2008.
  • Shaw, Spencer. Film Consciousness: From Phenomenology to Deleuze. Jefferson, NC: McFarland, 2008.
  • Smith, Murray & Thomas Wartenberg (eds.). Thinking through Cinema: Film as Philosophy. Malden, MA: Blackwell, 2006.
  • Smuts, Aaron. “Film as Philosophy: In Defense of a Bold Thesis” in Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 67:3, 2009, pp. 409-420.
  • Sobchack, Vivian. The Address of the Eye: A Phenomenology of Film Experience. Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Stam, Robert. Film Theory: An Introduction. Oxford: Blackwell, 1999.
  • Todorov, Tzvetan. Poétique. Paris: Seuil, 1973. Engl.: Introduction to Poetics. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1981.
  • Turvey, Malcolm. Doubting vision: Film and the Revelationist Tradition. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008.
  • Vice, Sue. Introducing Bakhtin. Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1997.
  • Wartenberg, Thomas E. Thinking on Screen: Film as Philosophy. London: Routledge, 2007.
  • Žižek, Slavoj. Everything You Always Wanted to Know about Lacan (But were Afraid to ask Hitchcock). London: Verso, 1992.
  • Žižek, Slavoj. Gaze and Voice as Love Objects. Durham: Duke University Press, 1996.
  • Žižek, Slavoj. The Fright of Real Tears: Krszystof Kieślowski Between Theory and Post-Theory. London: British Film Institute, 2001.

Author Information

Thorsten Botz-Bornstein
Gulf University

Josiah Royce (1855—1916): Overview

Josiah Royce was one of the most influential philosophers of the period of classical American philosophy, the late nineteenth century through the early twentieth century. Although often identified as an exponent of Absolute Idealism, which is a philosophical view explored by Royce particularly in his Gifford Lectures, Royce was a thinker of widely diverse interests and talents. He made major contributions to psychology including a textbook in the field and was, in fact, elected President of the American Psychological Association. He wrote a history of California, considered today a forerunner of contemporary historiography in its attention to the role of women and minority groups. He explored social ethics, developing many ideas on the social grounding of the self, some of which were later expanded upon by George Herbert Mead. Furthermore, Royce wrote on pressing social and political problems of the day including race relations. W.E.B. Dubois was one of his students. He wrote literary criticism and can be considered the founder of the Harvard school of logic, Boolean algebra, and the foundation of mathematics. Among his students at Harvard were Clarence Irving Lewis who went on to pioneer modal logic, Edward V. Huntington, the first to axiomatize Boolean algebra, and Henry M. Sheffer, known for the eponymous Sheffer stroke. Royce has recently been cited as a proto-cybernetic thinker; another of his students was Norbert Wiener, the father of cybernetics. Royce also wrote on issues in the philosophy of science.

In addition to these many philosophical achievements, Royce made major contributions to the Philosophy of Religion, writing on the problem of evil, and Christian community and presenting a phenomenological study of the religious experience of ordinary people. Royce also wrote throughout his career on ethical theory and on the conditions for creating both genuine and supportive communities as well as creative, unique, ethical individuality. At the end of his life he turned to the development of a world community through a process of mediation and interpretation.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Thought and Works
    1. Royce's Philosophy of Community
    2. Royce's Ethics: The Philosophy of Loyalty
    3. Religion
    4. The Problem of Evil
    5. Logic
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Published Editions
    3. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Josiah Royce was a Californian by birth, born on 20 November, 1855, in Grass Valley, the son of Josiah (1812-1888) and Sarah Eleanor (Bayliss) Royce (1819-1891), whose families were recent emigrants from England, and who sought their fortune in moving west in 1849. His pioneer mother Sarah was a central figure in forging a new social and political community in Grass Valley. She was the center of much musical activity with her melodeon, the first brought to California. She also helped found a church and served as a teacher of the young, including young Josiah. Under his mother’s tutelage, Josiah developed his love of literature, reading Milton and other literary works; made his acquaintance with the Bible and religious experience; was given an introduction to music and its beauty; and experienced the joys of a warm, loving community, his family, and particularly his mother and sisters. Young Josiah began his literary career with a delightful story of the travels of Pussy Blackie, a “Huckleberry Finn cat,” who runs away from home; gets bitten by a dog; is captured by an eagle; travels on a railroad car; lives in the house of a rich family; finds a cat companion with whom Pussy exchanges stories; discusses social issues such as the contrast between the rich and the poor, as well as the treatment of the less fortunate and moral questions such as honesty, shame, killing, and war. In 1866, the Royce family moved to San Francisco where Royce first attended the Lincoln School. Royce also attended San Francisco Boys’ High School where he had as a classmate the (later famous) physicist, Albert Michelson. Continuing his pioneer trek, Royce entered, at age fourteen, an infant University of California, later becoming one of its first graduates, thus participating in the beginnings of higher education in the state. After receiving his degree in Classics in 1875, Royce traveled to Germany to study philosophy for one year. He mastered the language while attending lectures in Heidelberg, Leipzig, and Göttingen. On his return, he entered the Johns Hopkins University in Baltimore and in 1878, was awarded one of its first four doctorates.

Josiah Royce returned to the University of California, Berkley from 1878-1882. He taught composition, and literature, published numerous philosophical articles and his Primer of Logical Analysis. He married Katherine Head in 1880; the couple had three sons (Christopher, 1882; Edward, 1886; Stephen, 1889) and remained married until Josiah’s death. Royce felt isolated in California, so far from the intellectual life of the East Coast, and he sought an academic post elsewhere. William James, Royce’s friend and philosophical antagonist, secured the opportunity for Royce to replace James at Harvard when James took a one-year sabbatical. In 1882, Royce accepted the position at half of James’ salary and brought his wife and newborn son across the continent to Cambridge, Massachusetts.

At Harvard, Royce began to develop his interest in a number of different areas. In 1885, he published his first major philosophical work, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy, proposing the idea that in order for our ordinary concepts of truth and error to have meaning, there must be an actual infinite mind, an “Absolute Knower,” who encompasses the totality of actual truths and possible errors. That same year, Royce received a permanent appointment as assistant professor at Harvard, where he continued to teach for thirty years. Among his students were such notables as T.S. Eliot, George Santayana, W.E.B. Dubois, Norbert Wiener, and C.I. Lewis, the logician.

Royce was a prolific writer as well as much demanded on the public lecture circuit. In 1886, he published his History of California; he followed this with a published novel in 1887. In 1892, Royce was appointed Professor of the History of Philosophy at Harvard, and he served as Chair of the Department of Philosophy from 1894-1898. During these years Royce established himself as a leading figure in American academic philosophy with his many reviews, lectures and books, including The Spirit of Modern Philosophy, (1892), The Conception of God (1897), and Studies in Good and Evil (1898).

In 1899, and 1900, Royce delivered the prestigious Gifford Lectures at the University of Aberdeen, taking this opportunity to consolidate his thoughts on metaphysics. The result was his two-volume opus, The World and the Individual (1899-1901). This point appeared to be the culmination of Royce’s work. His public reputation was at a high and at 45 years old, Royce was elected President of the American Psychological Association in 1902, and President of the American Philosophical Association in 1903. Reviewers of The World and the Individual praised Royce’s philosophical acumen but there were serious objections to his conclusions. Sparked by these and the criticisms of his logic by Charles Sanders Peirce, Royce began reconsideration of his arguments as well as extensive study in mathematical logic. He also returned to his earlier concerns with philosophy as a means to understand human life, the nature of human society, of religious experience, ethical action, suffering and the problem of evil. His major work on ethics, The Philosophy of Loyalty appeared in 1908, but his concern with ethical issues and the “art” of loyalty continued until his death. He published a collection of essays, Race Questions, Provincialisms, and Other American Problems in 1908 and another, William James and Other Essays on the Philosophy of Life, appeared in 1911.

In 1912, while recovering from a stroke, Royce published The Sources of Religious Insight, in which he sought an explanation for the phenomena of ordinary religious faith as experienced by ordinary religious communities and individuals. He considered this a correction to James’ The Varieties of Religious Experience (The Gifford Lectures, 1901-1902), which, in Royce’s judgment, put too much emphasis on extraordinary and individualistic religious experiences. Drawing on the semiotic of Peirce and other sources, in 1913, Royce published his opus on religious community, The Problem of Christianity, a work which Yale philosopher, John E. Smith identified as “one of the finest works in the philosophy of religion ever to appear on the American scene” (Smith 1982 &1992, 122). In place of the earlier “Absolute Knower,” Royce presents the concept of an infinite community of interpretation, guided by a shared spirit of truth-seeking and community building. The Universal Community constitutes reality, and its understanding increases over time, through its members’ continual development of meaning. Royce’s concern for building a universal or “Beloved Community” is exemplified in two later works focused on building peace and a world community: War and Insurance (1914) and The Hope of the Great Community (1916). In the 1914 book, Royce made a daring political and economic proposal to use the economic power of insurance to mediate hostilities among nations, and reduce the attraction of war in the future.

Royce died September 14, 1916, before he could develop fully his new philosophical insights. Unfortunately, Royce’s works were ignored until recently and now are being revisited by theologians and philosophers interested in not only metaphysics, but also practical and theoretical ethics, philosophy of religion, philosophy of self and of community.

2. Thought and Works

Royce’s major works include The Religious Aspect of Philosophy (1885), The World and the Individual (1899-1901), The Spirit of Modern Philosophy (1892), The Philosophy of Loyalty (1908), and The Problem of Christianity (1913). In his early works, Royce presented a novel defense of idealism, the “argument from error,” and arrived at the concept of an actual infinite mind, an “Absolute Knower,” that encompasses all truths and possible errors. The correspondence theory of truth requires that if an idea or judgment is true it must correctly represent its object; when an idea does not correctly represent its object, it is an error. Royce begins with the fact that the human mind often makes such errors and yet, argued Royce, the mind “intends” or “points to” the idea’s true object. Thus, the occurrence of these errors indicates that the true object of any idea must exist, in a fully determinate state, in some actual infinite mind; this actual infinite “Mind” is the “Absolute Knower.” Royce continued to pursue this move toward Idealism in The World and the Individual. Here we find Royce agreeing with Kantian critical rationalism that a true idea is one that may be fulfilled or validated by a possible experience, but he argued that such a possibility of experience required the existence of an actual being, whose nature was to be the true object of the experience. In this work, Royce engages in criticism of three major views of metaphysics, Realism, Mysticism, and Kant’s Critical Rationalism. He finds valuable points in all three views, but also critical weaknesses. He advocates a “Fourth Conception of Being,” a view of the totality of Being as an actual Infinite, timeless, and encompassing all valid past, present, and future possible experience of fact including the facts of all finite beings.

Royce continued to develop his thoughts spurred by various criticisms and particularly the friendly but longstanding dispute with William James known as "The Battle of the Absolute." In addition, he struggled with the problem of community and the relations of the individual and community both philosophically and practically, the latter concern evidenced in his writings on the history of California, the land disputes in California, various public problems and his deep concern for a solid theory of ethics. In answer to Charles Sanders Peirce, he turned to a deep exploration of logic, mathematics, and semiotics. In his later works, Royce dispenses with the “Absolute Mind/Knower” of previous works and develops a metaphysical view which characterizes reality as a universe of ideas or signs which occur in the process of being interpreted by an ongoing, infinite community of minds. These minds and the community they constitute also become signs for further interpretation. In The Problem of Christianity he sees representation no longer as a static, one-time experience, but as having creative, synthetic and selective aspects and knowledge is now more than accurate and completed perception of an object, or complete conception of an idea, it is a process of interpretation. This new metaphysical view is reflected in Royce’s work on ethics, philosophy of religion, philosophy of community, social philosophy and logic.

a. Royce's Philosophy of Community

Royce was concerned about the impact of an extreme individualism and particularly with the “heroic individualism” associated with Walt Whitman, Ralph Waldo Emerson, and William James. Though inspiring as ethical visions, Royce believed these views eventually proved unsatisfactory for ethical life. While affirming the "individual" as a "most fundamental phenomenon," he sought to address the problem of forming satisfactory communities and dealing with competing forms of community. In his later metaphysics Royce affirms the full-fledged reality of both individuals and community. In the practical social and political realm, Royce tackled the dual issues of “enlightened/genuine individualism,” and “true/genuine community.” He recognized that the task of building authentic individuality and encouraging the growth of fulfilling, moral communities were inextricably bound together—worthwhile individuality and community arising out of their mutual interaction in a creative, ongoing, infinite process.

Thus, Royce develops the following claims: (1) individuals are inextricably rooted in the social context and true individuality is forged out of that context. An individual is both self-made and a social product and the worthiness of the end result, the individual self, is the responsibility of both individual and community; (2) community is a social product, but true community is created by the hard work of free, self-conscious, self-committed, self-creative moral individuals; (3) the task of the individual is both to fashion a “beautiful life” and to build a “beautiful” community, while the obligation of community is to build a harmony of wills while also fostering the development of true individuals; (4) individuals are finite, sinful and fallible and need to extend self to develop morality and overcome error. Furthermore, individuals crave harmony and relationship. Individuals keep communities alive, moral, and sane by keeping them from stagnating into inveterate habit, moving toward exclusivity and intolerance, or degenerating into mob madness. In other words, stress must be equally on the individual and the community. For Royce, “individuals without community are without substance, while communities without individuals are blind.”

In light of the strong individualistic emphasis in philosophy today, it is striking that for Royce communities are logically prior to individuals. For Royce, there is no personal identity unless there are communities of persons that provide causes and social roles for individuals to embrace. Royce declares: “My life means nothing, either theoretically or practically, unless I am a member of a community” (Royce 2001 [1913], 357). And community is more than any association or collection of individuals; communities can only exist, in Royce’s view, where individual members are in communication with one another and there exists to some relevant way a congruence of feeling, thought and will among them. A community is for Royce, as is the human self, a temporal being. He speaks of a community of memory and ac community of hope. Each of the community’s members accepts, as part of his/her own individual life and self, some past events and the same expected future events. And, like human selves, communities are “plans of action” engaged in purposive activity in the world and constituting a will and a spirit and, for Royce, also, like human selves, morally responsible for its communal actions.

b. Royce's Ethics: The Philosophy of Loyalty

At the center of Royce’s ethics is his contention that to lead a morally significant life, one’s actions must express a self-consciously asserted will; the self is a plan of action, a plan of life created by an individual out of the chaos of many conflicting personal desires and impulses. Such a plan is forged when one finds a cause, or causes which require a program or programs of implementation that extend through time and requires the contributions of many individuals for their advancement and fulfillment. When an individual finds a cause judged worthwhile, his/her will becomes focused and defined in terms of that cause and furthermore, the individual becomes allied with a community of others who are also committed to that same cause. Royce calls this commitment “loyalty” and thus the moral life of an individual is understood in terms of the multiple loyalties that a person embraces. “There is only one way to be an ethical individual. That is to choose your cause, and then to serve it” (Royce 1995 [l908], 47).

According to Royce’s careful definition of loyalty, “genuine” loyalty is intended to rule out loyalty to morally evil causes and communities that serve them. Royce fully recognized that many of the worst deed in human history have involved a high degree of loyalty, but, argued Royce, these loyalties were directed exclusively to a particular group and expressed in the destruction of the conditions for others’ loyal actions, Royce describes the difference between true loyalty and vicious or “predatory” loyalty as follows:

A cause is good, not only for me, but for mankind, in so far, as it is essentially a “loyalty to loyalty,” that is, an aid, and a furtherance of loyalty in my fellows. It is an evil cause in so far as, despite the loyalty that it arouses in me, it is destructive of loyalty in the world of my fellows (Royce 1995 {1908}, 56).

Communities defined by true loyalty, or adherence to a cause that exemplifies the universal ideal of “loyalty to loyalty” are referred to by Royce as “genuine communities.” Again, the degenerate communities are those that tend toward the destruction of other’s causes and possibilities of loyalty. While every community works for the accomplishment of its central cause, Royce places significant emphasis on the idea of loyalty to a “lost cause.” A lost cause is not a hopeless cause but rather one that cannot be fulfilled within the actual lifetime of any of its members. These causes are those that are “lost” simply in virtue of their scope and magnitude and these are precisely the causes that establish ideals capable of evoking our highest hope and moral commitment. “Lost causes” are indispensable, in Royce’s view, as the source of absolute norms for any community and its members.

For Royce, chief among such causes is the full attainment of truth, the complete determination of the nature of reality through inquiry and interpretation. Thus, the formula of “loyalty to loyalty” demands that one’s moral and intellectual sphere become ever broader and remain critical at all levels. In this connection, Royce reframed two central ideas or principles of pragmatism. Following James in his essay, “The Will to Believe,” Royce agreed that any philosophical view is essentially an expression of individual volition. We must first decide how we are to approach the world and then develop our philosophical theories accordingly. For Royce, the essential attitude of will that one must adopt toward the world is “loyalty to the ideal of an ultimate truth.” Secondly, Royce adopted the pragmatist view of truth, that is, truth is the property possessed by those ideas that succeed in the long run. And, following Peirce, Royce argues that to define truth using any conception of “the long run, short of the ideal end of inquiry, is self-refuting.” Having adopted these pragmatic principles, Royce referred to his own position as “Absolute Pragmatism.”

Returning to the principles of “loyalty to loyalty,” it becomes clear that, for Royce, all communities we actually know, inhabit, or identify with, are finite and to varying degrees “predatory.” Roycean loyalty requires one to scrutinize the aims and actions of our communities and those of others and to work to reform the disloyal aspects. The philosophy of loyalty calls upon us to create and embrace more cosmopolitan and inclusive communities. However, any human community, however, inclusive and committed to loyalty to loyalty, will fall short of perfect loyalty. Each community must constantly engage in critical scrutiny and actions of reform. For Royce, there is no expectation that the high ideals of perfect loyalty, truth, and reality will ever be fully realized. The process of building community is an ongoing, infinite process.

Finally, for Royce, beyond the actual communities that we directly encounter in life there is the ideal “Beloved Community” of all those who would be fully dedicated to the cause of loyalty, truth, and reality itself. This is the ultimate goal and cause. Furthermore, the sharing of individuals’ feeling, thoughts and wills in a community (including the Beloved Community) is never, for Royce, a mystical blurring or annihilation of personal identities. Individuals remain individuals, but in forming a community they build or attain a second order life that extends beyond any of their individuals lives. This life is a life coordinated through a cause and extended over time, a super-human personality at work, a community united by an “interpreting spirit.” Again, communities are more than their individual members and individuals are always unique and not lost in their communities; individuals and communities need each other.

c. Religion

Through the strong influence of his mother, Sarah Royce, and the early education she provided him and his sisters, Royce was well acquainted with the Christian Protestant world view and his writings exhibited a consistent familiarity with Scripture and with religious themes. Royce, in his own life did not embrace organized Christianity, and he was critical of many historical churches, believing that they had lost sight of the “spirit” of community that ought to guide them. He identified many “communities of grace,” genuine communities of loyalty, that were non-Christian or not self-consciously religious. Royce had a great respect for Buddhism and he even learned Sanskrit to study religious texts in this language. Although Royce maintained a strong interest in logic, science, evolutionary theory, and natural philosophy throughout his career, religious concerns did figure prominently in a number of his works beginning with his first major publication, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy as well as in his last two major works, The Sources of Religious Insight and The Problem of Christianity. The Sources was Royce’s response to the Gifford Lectures delivered by William James in 1901-1902 and published as The Varieties of Religious experience. James’ lectures were a popular and academic success and remain so even today. Royce, however, believed that James placed too much emphasis on the extraordinary religious experience of extraordinary individuals and thus failed to capture the religious experiences of the ordinary individual. Furthermore, Royce believed that religion was a central phenomenon of human experience that could not be ignored by philosophers. In The Problem of Christianity Royce works out his own religious thought and his full-blown theory of community. He maintains that the Christian model of the “loyal community,” properly understood, successfully combined the true spirit of universal interpretation with an appreciation of the “infinite worth” of the individual as a unique member of the ideal Beloved Community, the Kingdom of Heaven (Royce 2001[1913], 193). It is in this book that Royce also brings to fruition his thought and concern with the problem of evil.

Royce’s approach to religion was empirical, historical and phenomenological as well as concerned with philosophical reflection. Thus, in a 1909 essay, “What is Vital in Christianity?,” Royce approaches religion with a historic-empirical approach akin to modern anthropology. He views the religion as it has developed within human history. He writes: “any religion presents itself as a more or less connected group: (1) of religious practices, such as prayers, ceremonies, festivals, rituals and other observance, and (2) of religious ideas, the ideas taking the form of traditions, legends, and beliefs about the gods or spirits” (Royce 1911 [1909], 101). The term “vital,” says Royce, is metaphoric, such as the “vital” features of an organism. If these changed the organism would not necessarily be destroyed but would be an essentially different type of organism. Royce illustrates with the features, gill breathing” and “lung breathing.” But “vital,” also connotes “alive” for the persons who are followers of the religion and this usage is similar to Paul Tillich’s understanding of religious symbols as alive or dying. Furthermore, this term means also “primary” in practice. Thus, Royce says his first question is: “What is more vital about a religion: its religious practices, or its religious ideas, beliefs, and spiritual attitudes?” In this essay, in a humorous passage about pigeons in the Harvard Yard observing the habits of humans who feed them and concluding to the existence of a benevolent creator, Royce critiques the causal approach to God, represented in many of the proofs for God’s existence.

Royce again approaches religion through a historical-philosophical analysis in an encyclopedia article entitled “Monotheism.” After briefly reviewing monotheism as a doctrine in contrast to polytheism and pantheism, Royce makes the following claim: “…from the historical point of view, three different ways of viewing the divine being have been of great importance both for religious life and for philosophical doctrine” (Royce 1916, 818). The three ways to which Royce refers are three forms of monotheism, which were established in India, Greece, and Israel.

Royce then discusses, what in his view, are the essential features of monotheism as developed in these three cultural contexts. From Israel, we have “the ethical monotheism of the Prophets of Israel,” and “God,” in this religious context is defined as “the righteous Ruler of the world,” as the “Doer of justice,” or as the one “whose law is holy” or “who secures the triumph of the right”(Royce, 1916). Turning to Greece and to “Hellenistic monotheism,” God is defined as the “source, of the explanation, or the correlate, or the order, or the reasonableness of the world” (Royce, 1916). The third type of monotheism is labeled “Hindu pantheism.” Royce notes that this understanding had many different historical origins and appeared, in fact, as part of the Neo-Platonic philosophy and the philosophy of Spinoza. This type of monotheism insists not only upon the “sole” reality of God, but also asserts the “unreality of the world” (Royce, 1916).

In an interesting move, Royce argues that the “whole history of Christian monotheism depends upon an explicit effort to make a synthesis of the ethical monotheism of Israel and the Hellenic form of monotheism (Royce, 1916) This effort, however, says Royce, has proven especially difficult. The Hellenic tradition with its intellectualistic emphasis on the Logos was in favor of defining the unity of the divine being and the world as the essential feature of monotheism, whereas ethical monotheism dwells upon the contrast between the righteous Ruler and the sinful world, and between divine grace and fallen man. Royce, then, concludes:

Therefore, behind many of the conflicts between the so-called pantheism in Christian tradition and the doctrines of “divine transcendence” and “divine personality,” there has lain the conflict between intellectualism and voluntarism, between an interpretation of the world in terms of order and an interpretation of the world in terms of the conflict between good and evil, righteousness and unrighteousness (Royce, 1916, 819).

This history is made even more complex, says Royce, due to the influence of the Indic type of God. This concept influenced mysticism and, of course, Neo-platonic philosophy which, in turn, influenced Christian philosophy and theology. Augustine is a prime example of this influence. Furthermore, within Christianity, the mystics have often pointed to the failure to resolve the conflict with the moral and intellectual interests. Royce writes:

The mystics…have always held that the results of the intellect are negative and lead to no definite idea of God which can be defended against the skeptics, while…to follow the law of righteousness, whether or not with the aid of divine grace, does not lead, at least in the present life, to the highest type of knowledge of God (Royce, 1916).

Then, Royce, with his respect for the experiential in religion, writes: “Without this third type of monotheism, and without this negative criticism of the work of the intellect, and this direct appeal to immediate experience, Christian doctrine, in fact, would not have reached some of its most characteristic forms and expressions, and the philosophy of Christendom would have failed to put on record some of its most fascinating speculations" (Royce, 1916).

Royce then reviews the history of the so-called “proofs for God’s existence,” generally an expression of the Hellenistic influence in Christianity, and says that there is some basis in the claim that these efforts to grasp the divine nature via the intellect leads to results remote “from the vital experience upon which religious monotheism, and in particular, Christian monotheism must rest, if such…is permanently to retain the confidence of a man who is at once critical and religious (Royce, 1916).

Finally, it is not surprising that Royce argues that whatever answers to the questions about the nature of the world – is it real, rational, ethical? – that are developed must not put exclusive emphasis on any one characteristic. For, “as we have seen, the problem of monotheism requires a synthesis of all the three ideas of God,” thus any attempt to address these three questions must be an answer that does adequate justice to the three ideas and the three problems (Royce, 1916). Royce’s own efforts were aimed at achieving this synthesis and providing an answer to these three questions. Thus, he sought in his conceptions of God to give an account of the nature of reality that would satisfy the “moral insight,” “the theoretic insight,” and the “religious insight.” And the three Conceptions of Being addressed in The World and the Individual embody aspects of the three ideas of God and address the three questions.

Turning now to The Sources of Religious Insight, as indicated earlier, it is a parallel to The Varieties of Religious Experience by William James, yet it transcends that work in a number of ways. First, it explores religious experience common to much of mankind rather than the special, genius cases that are the subject of James’ work. Second, it studies both individual and communal religious experience whereas James’ work focuses on the experiences of extraordinary individuals. Third, The Sources is solidly based in the empirical and experiential. Royce writes: “The issue will be one regarding the facts of living experience” (Royce, 1912). James, in his work seeks to explain man’s religious need in terms of an experience that wells up from the subliminal self, from the soundless depths of our own subconscious. Royce, on the other hand, asserts that, “the principal religious motives are indeed perfectly natural human motives” (Royce, 1912,41-42). Man’s religious experience is, as a natural process, an incident in the history of his sensitive life, of his personal interpretation of the world, and of his more or less creative effort to fulfill his needs, and to respond in his own way to the universe. Religious experience, then, for Royce, is natural and profoundly personal and social - it is the experience of a human self in the history of his own life, set in the material, historical, social, and cultural context of that individual history and life.

Beginning then with human experience and needs, Royce seeks to get at the heart of “religious experience.” He states that the “central and essential postulate” of every religion is that “man needs to be saved” (Royce 2001[1912], 8-9). Salvation is necessary, for Royce, for two reasons: (1) There is some aim or end of human life which is more important than all other aims; and (2) Man, as he now is, or is naturally, is always in great danger of missing this highest aim and thus to render his whole life “a senseless failure” (Royce 2001 [1912], 12). This salvation must come in the form of guidance about understanding and achieving the highest aim of life so far as one is able. But given the limitations and fallibility of the human perspective, which hardly extends “beyond one’s nose,” Royce contends that this needed guidance must come from some super-human source. Religion, then, is the sphere of life in which finite human beings are able to get in touch with this source. It is interesting that in seeking to demonstrate the validity of his postulate he reviews the essentials of Buddhism, the writings of Plato in The Republic, and various literary sources. He believes that these examples show that the search for salvation belongs to no “one type of piety or of poetry or of philosophy” (Royce, 1912, 15).

The next major question is “what are the sources of insight?” Royce will consider seven sources, beginning with the human self, viewed first as uniquely individual and then as social. These are the basic and most elementary. However, Royce will find individual life and social life insufficient to meet the religious need for salvation. He then turns to five other sources. These are all dependent on the first two sources but will develop, strengthen, correct and transform in some way these. The five are: reason as a synthesizing power; the will or the volitional; loyalty; the religious mission of sorrow, and the unified community of the spirit.

In turning to the individual alone with his problem of salvation and with his efforts to know the divine that can save, Royce asserts that the individual can be in touch with a genuine source of insight, one of value, although also a source with limits. There are, says Royce, three objects which individual experience, as a source of religious insight, can reveal: The Ideal, the Need, and the Deliverer. The Ideal is, of course, the standard in terms of which the individual estimates the sense and value of his personal life. The Need for salvation is that degree to which he falls short of attaining his ideal and is sundered from this Ideal by evil fortune, his own paralysis of will, or by his inward baseness. The Deliverer is that presence, that power, that light, that truth, that great companion who helps the individual and saves him from his need.

We as humans are creatures of wavering and conflicting motives and, although we strongly desire a unity that makes life meaningful, we, on our own, cannot find this unity; we always miss our mark. Furthermore, we have glimpses of what would fulfill us, what would meet our need: a life “infinitely richer than our own.” As James, argues, we want to get in touch with something that will give us a “new dimension” to our lives. We want something more. Furthermore, for Royce, our need and desire are crucial. Royce writes: “Unless you have inwardly felt the need of salvation and learned to hunger and thirst after spiritual unity and self-possession, all the rest of religious insight is to you a sealed book” (Royce 1912, 33).

However, the individual alone cannot achieve what is needed. Thus we must turn to the social and to shared human life to attain a broader religious insight. Royce writes: “…no one who remains content with his merely individual experience of the presence of the divine and of his deliverer, has won the whole of any true insight. For as a fact, we are all members one of another; and I can have no insight into the way of my salvation unless I thereby learn of the way of salvation for all my brethren. And there is no unity of the spirit unless all men are privileged to enter it whenever they see it and know it and love it” (Royce, 1912, 34). Here is Royce’s emphasis on the need for social expansion of the self, as loyalty to loyalty demands expansion of the perspective of the community. Indeed, Royce argues that one of the principal sources of our need for salvation is our narrowness of view and especially of the meaning of our own purposes and motives. The social world, as Royce has constantly argued, broadens our outlook; an individual corrects his own narrowness by trying to share his fellow’s point of view. Social responsibilities can set limits to our fickleness; social discipline can keep us from indulging all our caprices; human companionship may steady our vision. The social world may bring us in touch with our public, great self, wherein we may find our “soul and its interests writ large” (Royce, 1912, 55). Social life is a source of religious insight and the insight it can bring is knowledge of “salvation through the fostering of human brotherhood” (Royce, 1912, 58).

Another avenue to religious insight, for Royce, is the experience of moral suffering, of the deep sense of guilt accompanied by the belief that one is an outcast from human sympathy and is hopelessly alone. He illustrates this with two literary examples: “The Ancient Mariner” and Raskolnikov in Crime and Punishment. The central conception in these two literary pieces is of salvation as reconciliation both with the social and the divine order, an escape from the wilderness of lonely guilt to the realm where men can understand one another.

This brings us directly to the “religious mission of sorrow.” Sorrows are defined by Royce as evils that we can assimilate. These become part of a constructive process, which involves growth rather than destruction, a passage to a new life. We takes these sorrows up into our plan of life, give them new meaning as they become part of a new whole. This was Royce’s emphasis in his essays on the problem of evil as well as in Religious Aspect and The Spirit. This will be discussed more in the section on the Problem of Evil.

The stage is now set for The Problem of Christianity. Christianity is viewed as a “philosophy of life,” and the question Royce asks is “In what sense, if any, can the modern man consistently be, in creed, a Christian?” (Royce, 2001 [1913], 62). In focusing on “creed,” however, Royce is clear that he is not concerned here with dogma or with particular theological beliefs. Rather he seeks the essentially “vital” and living ideas that will find expression in communal practices and religious-moral living and that will speak to all humanity. Royce will focus on living religious experience as was expressed in the early Pauline Christian communities. Royce’s focus is on the incarnation of the Spirit in the living Church, it is the Church, rather than the person of the founder that is the central idea of Christianity. For Royce, the essence of Christianity is its stress on the “saving community.” Royce writes: “The thesis of this book is that the essence of Christianity, as the Apostle Paul stated that essence, depends upon regarding the being which the early Christian Church believed itself to represent, and the being which I call…the ‘Beloved Community,’ as the true source, through loyalty, of the salvation of man” (Royce, 2001 [1913], 45).

It is indeed the “community” which allows us to understand more fully the teachings of the Master. Of Jesus’ teaching, Royce found two ideas especially crucial: his preaching of love and the “Kingdom of Heaven.” Both were mysterious and in need of interpretation. Thus, “love” is a mystery for although we know we are to love God and our neighbor, the question is how. How can I be practically useful in meeting my neighbor’s needs? Anyone who has tried to be benevolent or to meet the needs of others knows that there can be a huge crevice between your interpretation of what that person needs and their belief in that matter. It is the interpretation of Jesus’ teachings in the letters of Paul that make the difference for Royce. That which can make the loving of our neighbor less mysterious and difficult is community, for a community “when united by an active developing purpose is an entity more concrete, and, in fact, less mysterious than any individual man (Royce, 2001 [1913] 94). In community, we can come to know each other, to see what each other’s needs are. I need not ask “who is my neighbor?” for my neighbor and I are both members of one and the same community.

The essence of Christianity, for Royce, is contained in three ideas. The first of these is that the source and means of salvation is the community of believers. Community is also the basis of the ethic of love taught by Jesus. The other two essential ideas are: “the moral burden of the individual and “atonement.” These are addressed in the section on evil.

d. The Problem of Evil

Josiah Royce struggled with the problem of evil throughout his life, exploring it from various approaches, and asserting that it could neither be avoided nor dismissed by either the philosopher or the ordinary person. Thus, unlike some philosophers, he did not believe the problem of evil could be solved as a practical problem that only required improving social conditions. As a native Californian, a historian, and a social observer of the development of early California, Royce explored ways in which evil manifested itself in social relations among persons, in social bodies infected with racism, greed, and in a variety of harmful prejudices, in expressions of hate and in mob violence. Ultimately, Royce embraced a theistic process metaphysics that recognizes evil as a real force and suffering as an irreducible fact of experience. In his 1897 essay, “The Problem of Job,” Royce presents a fairly succinct overview of the problem of evil, various solutions and his own view on a possible solution. In the Job story, we have a traditional view of God as wise, omnipotent, all powerful, and all good and the situation of Job, namely, a universal situation of unearned ill-fortune, a seeming persecution of a righteous person and a reigning down of evils on a good man. For Royce, Job represents the fundamental psychological fact about the problem of evil, namely, the universal experience of unearned ill-fortune. This, asserts Royce, is the experience of every person, the kind of evil that all persons can see for themselves every day if they choose. This is the fundamental experiential and psychological fact that grounds Royce’s own answers to the problem of evil and also his dismissal of the various traditional answers to the problem of evil. Thus, for example there is the view that the purpose of the world is “soul making,” that pain teaches us the ways of the world and helps us develop our higher potentialities. Royce believes this answer is inadequate because it presupposes a greater evil, namely a world which allows evils as the only way to reach given goals. Such an answer Royce believes is unacceptable to a sufferer of evil and undeserved ills.

Another answer to the problem of evil is the infinite worth of agents with free will. Royce finds value in this view in that it acknowledges evil as a logically necessary part of a perfect moral order, but he believes this answer ultimately fails. A major problem is Job’s situation, namely, the innocent sufferer. Such unearned ills may be partly due to the free will that partly caused them, but, asserts Royce, the unearned ills are also due to God who declines to protect the innocent.

Royce believes that as long as one views God as an external power, as Job did, the problem of evil cannot be solved. Rather, one must recognize God as internally present to us and as suffering with us to produce the higher good. When we suffer, our sufferings are God’s sufferings and this is the case because without suffering, evil, and tragedy, God’s life could not be perfected. Furthermore, asserts Royce, personal overcoming evil is the essence of the moral life. Persons are instruments of God’s triumph. Thus, in The Sources of Religious Insight, Royce presents man as a destroyer of evil, a being who uses every effort to get rid of evil. Conquering evils and oppressions provide man’s greatest opportunities for loyalty and here is the source of religious insight and spiritual triumph. The encounter of human selves with the problem of evil is, for Royce, the most important moral aspect of the world. One must see the problematic situation into which human selves are immersed as part of the atoning process which tends toward an ultimate reconciliation of finite conflicts. Confronted with evils, one needs to trust within one’s limited view that the Spirit of the Universal Community reconciles.

Ultimately, Royce sees evil as an eternal part of both human and divine consciousness and the most important moral fact of the universe the human conquering of evil step by step. In addressing the doctrine of atonement in The Problem, Royce sets out in detail how the loyal community can best respond to human evil. The highest transgression in an ethics of loyalty is treason, or the willful betrayal of one’s own cause and the community of people who serve it. Such a betrayal is moral suicide for it threatens to destroy the network of purposes and social relationships that define the traitor’s self. The traitor is in what Royce calls “the hell of the irrevocable” (Royce, 2001 [1913], 162). Royce seeks an explanation of atonement which acknowledges this irrevocable nature of the deed that has been done, and which changes everything for the sinner and the community that has been harmed. None of the tradition Christian accounts of atonement are satisfactory. The answer, for Royce, is that the act of atonement can only be accomplished by the community, or on the behalf of the community, through the steadfast “loyal servant who acts, so to speak, as the incarnation of the spirit of the community itself” (Royce, 2011 [1913], 180). This person serves as a mediating party between the traitor and the betrayed community and through the atoning act genuine community is restored and all the individuals may emerge as wiser, more commitment servants of their common cause. Things are not the same as before the treason but, in fact, transformed and better. Royce then states what he believes to be the central postulate of the highest form of human spirituality, namely, that “No baseness or cruelty of treason so deep or so tragic shall enter our human world, but that loyal love shall be able in due time to oppose to just that deed of treason its fitting deed of atonement” (Royce 2001 [1913], 186). In the spirit of James, Royce asserts that this postulate cannot be proven true, but human communities can assert it and act upon it as it is were true.

e. Logic

Royce pursued his interest in logic, mathematics and science throughout his career. His first published book was a Primer of Logical Analysis for the Use of Composition Students, written for his students in California in 1881. His own proposal for a system of formal logic was published as “The Relation of the Principles of Logic to the Foundations of Geometry” in 1905, a work later extended in 1914. Among his last writings were a series of encyclopedia articles on logical topics: Axiom, Error and Truth, Mind, Negation, and Order (all reprinted in Robinson, 1951).

In addition to his discussion of science in The Religious Aspect of Philosophy, The World and the Individual, and in The Problem of Christianity, Royce published a series of articles on scientific method:” The Mechanical, Historical and the Statistical,” “The Social Character of Scientific Inquiry,” (in Josiah Royce’s Late Writings); Hypotheses and Leading Ideas,” and Introduction to H. Poincaré, The Foundations of Science (reprinted in Robinson). Like Peirce, Royce argued for the self-corrective nature of the scientific method; the necessity of experience as the starting point of inquiry; an emphasis on scientific instinct and imaginative judgment in forming hypotheses; the requirement of a proper motive - the search for truth and not fame or profit - as a necessary condition, along with the correct method, for the success of science and essence of science, the notion of science as a communal endeavor, dependent on the contributions of many others, past, present and future, and finally for the thoroughly human and fallible nature of science.

3. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Royce, Josiah, Primer of Logical Analysis for the Use of Composition Students, San Francisco, California: A.L. Bancroft and Co., 1881.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy: A critique of the Bases of Conduct and Faith, Boston, New York: Houghton Mifflin & Co., 1885.
  • Royce, Josiah, California from the Conquest in 1846 to the Second Vigilance Committee in San Francisco [1856]: A Study of American Character, Boston and New York: Houghton, Mifflin and Co. 1886.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Spirit of Modern Philosophy: An Essay in the Form of Lectures, Boston: Houghton Mifflin, 1892.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Conception of God: A Philosophical Discussion Concerning the Nature of the Divine Idea as a Demonstrable Reality, New York: The Macmillan Co, 1897. This includes commentary by Joseph LeConte, George Holmes Howison, and Sidney Edward Mezes.
  • Royce, Josiah, Studies in Good and Evil, New York, Appleton, 1898.
  • Royce, Josiah, The World and the Individual, 2 vols., New York: Macmillan, 1899.
  • Royce, Josiah, Outlines of Psychology: An Elementary Treatise with Some Practical Applications, New York: Macmillan, 1903.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Philosophy of Loyalty, New York: Macmillan, 1908.
  • Royce, Josiah, Race Questions, Provincialism, and Other American Problems, New York: Macmillan, 1908.
  • Royce, Josiah, William James and Other Essays on the Philosophy of Life, New York: Macmillan, 1911.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Sources of Religious Insight, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 2001 [1913]. Also at
  • Royce, Josiah, The Problem of Christianity, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 2001 [1913].
  • Royce, Josiah, War and Insurance, New York: Macmillan, 1914.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Hope of the Great Community, New York: Macmillan, 1916.

b. Published Editions

  • Robinson, D.S., ed. Royce’s Logical Essays: Collected Logical Essays of Josiah Royce, Dubuque, Iowa: W. C. Brown, 1951.
  • McDermott, J.J., ed. The Basic Writings of Josiah Royce, New York: Fordham University Press, 2 vols., 2005 [1969].
  • Clendenning, J., Ed. The Letters of Josiah Royce, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1970.
  • Oppenheim, F., ed. Josiah Royce’s Late Writings: A Collection of Unpublished and Scattered Works, Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 2 vols.

c. Secondary Sources

  • Auxier, R, ed., Critical Responses to Josiah Royce, 1885-1916, Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 3 vols., 2000.
  • Auxier, R, Time, Will, and Purpose: Living Ideas From the Philosophy of Josiah Royce, Open Court, 2011.
  • Clendenning, The Life and Thought of Josiah Royce, revised and expanded ed., Nashville, Tennessee: Vanderbilt University Press, 1999.
  • Kegley, J., Genuine Individuals and Genuine Communities: A Roycean Public Philosophy, Nashville, Tennessee, 1997.
  • Kegley, J. Josiah Royce in Focus, Bloomington, Indiana: Indiana University Press, 2008.
  • Kiklick, B., Josiah Royce: An Intellectual Biography, Indianapolis, Indiana: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1985.
  • Marcel, G., Royce’s Metaphysics, trans. V. and G. Ringer, Chicago: Henry Regnery Company, 1956. This was originally published as La Mėtaphysique de Royce, Paris, 1945.
  • Oppenheim, F.M. Royce’s Voyage Down Under: A Journey of the Mind, Lexington: University of Kentucky Press, 1980.
  • Oppenheim, F.M., Royce’s Mature Philosophy of Religion, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 1987.
  • Oppenheim, F.M., Royce’s Mature Ethics, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 1993.
  • Oppenheim, F.M., Reverence for the Relations of Life: Re-examining Pragmatism via Josiah Royce’s Interactions with Peirce, James, and Dewey, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 2005.
  • Smith, J.E. Royce South Infinite: The Community of Interpretation, Hamden, Conn.: Archon Books, 1969.
  • Tunstall, Dwayne, Yes, but Not Quite: Encountering Josiah Royce’s Ethico-Religious Insight, New York: Fordham University Press, 2009.
  • Trotter, G., On Royce, Belmont, California: Wadsworth, 2001.

Author Information

Jacquelyn Ann K. Kegley
California State University Bakersfield
U. S. A.

Arthur Schopenhauer (1788—1860)

Arthur Schopenhauer has been dubbed the artist’s philosopher on account of the inspiration his aesthetics has provided to artists of all stripes. He is also known as the philosopher of pessimism, as he articulated a worldview that challenges the value of existence. His elegant and muscular prose earn him a reputation as one the greatest German stylists. Although he never achieved the fame of such post-Kantian philosophers as Johann Gottlieb Fichte and G.W.F. Hegel in his lifetime, his thought informed the work of such luminaries as Sigmund Freud, Ludwig Wittgenstein and, most famously, Friedrich Nietzsche. He is also known as the first German philosopher to incorporate Eastern thought into his writings.

Schopenhauer’s thought is iconoclastic for a number of reasons. Although he considered himself Kant’s only true philosophical heir, he argued that the world was essentially irrational. Writing in the era of German Romanticism, he developed an aesthetics that was classicist in its emphasis on the eternal. When German philosophers were entrenched in the universities and immersed in the theological concerns of the time, Schopenhauer was an atheist who stayed outside the academic profession.

Schopenhauer’s lack of recognition during most of his lifetime may have been due to the iconoclasm of his thought, but it was probably also partly due to his irascible and stubborn temperament. The diatribes against Hegel and Fichte peppered throughout his works provide evidence of his state of mind. Regardless of the reason Schopenhauer’s philosophy was overlooked for so long, he fully deserves the prestige he enjoyed altogether too late in his life.

Table of Contents

  1. Schopenhauer’s Life
  2. Schopenhauer’s Thought
    1. The World as Will and Representation
      1. Schopenhauer’s Metaphysics and Epistemology
      2. The Ideas and Schopenhauer’s Aesthetics
    2. The Human Will
      1. Agency and Freedom
      2. Ethics
  3. Schopenhauer’s Pessimism
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources Available in English
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Schopenhauer’s Life

Arthur Schopenhauer was born on February 22, 1788 in Danzig (now Gdansk, Poland) to a prosperous merchant, Heinrich Floris Schopenhauer, and his much younger wife, Johanna. The family moved to Hamburg when Schopenhauer was five, because his father, a proponent of enlightenment and republican ideals, found Danzig unsuitable after the Prussian annexation. His father wanted Arthur to become a cosmopolitan merchant like himself and hence traveled with Arthur extensively in his youth. His father also arranged for Arthur to live with a French family for two years when he was nine, which allowed Arthur to become fluent in French. From an early age, Arthur wanted to pursue the life of a scholar. Rather than force him into his own career, Heinrich offered a proposition to Arthur: the boy could either accompany his parents on a tour of Europe, after which time he would apprentice with a merchant, or he could attend a gymnasium in preparation for attending university. Arthur chose the former option, and his witnessing firsthand on this trip the profound suffering of the poor helped shape his pessimistic philosophical worldview.

After returning from his travels, Arthur began apprenticing with a merchant in preparation for his career. When Arthur was 17 years old, his father died, most likely as a result of suicide. Upon his death, Arthur, his sister Adele, and his mother were each left a sizable inheritance. Two years following his father’s death, with the encouragement of his mother, Schopenhauer freed himself of his obligation to honor the wishes of his father, and he began attending a gymnasium in Gotha. He was an extraordinary pupil: he mastered Greek and Latin while there, but was dismissed from the school for lampooning a teacher.

In the meantime his mother, who was by all accounts not happy in the marriage, used her newfound freedom to move to Weimar and become engaged in the social and intellectual life of the city. She met with great success there, both as a writer and as a hostess, and her salon became the center of the intellectual life of the city with such luminaries as Johann Wolfgang von Goethe, the Schlegel brothers (Karl Wilhelm Friedrich and August Wilhelm), and Christoph Martin Wieland regularly in attendance. Johanna’s success had a bearing on Arthur’s future, for she introduced him to Goethe, which eventually led to their collaboration on a theory of colors. At one of his mother’s gatherings, Schopenhauer also met the Orientalist scholar Friedrich Majer, who stimulated in Arthur a lifelong interest in Eastern thought. At the same time, Johanna and Arthur never got along well: she found him morose and overly critical and he regarded her as a superficial social climber. The tensions between them reached its peak when Arthur was 30 years old, at which time she requested that he never contact her again.

Before his break with his mother, Arthur matriculated to the University of Göttingen in 1809, where he enrolled in the study of medicine. In his third semester at Göttingen, Arthur decided to dedicate himself to the study of philosophy, for in his words: “Life is an unpleasant business… I have resolved to spend mine reflecting on it.” Schopenhauer studied philosophy under the tutelage of Gottlieb Ernst Schultz, whose major work was a critical commentary of Kant’s system of transcendental idealism. Schultz insisted that Schopenhauer begin his study of philosophy by reading the works of Immanuel Kant and Plato, the two thinkers who became the most influential philosophers in the development of his own mature thought. Schopenhauer also began a study of the works of Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling, of whose thought he became deeply critical.

Schopenhauer transferred to Berlin University in 1811 for the purpose of attending the lectures of Johann Gottlieb Fichte, who at the time was considered the most exciting and important German philosopher of his day. Schopenhauer also attended Friedrich Schleiermacher’s lectures, for Schleiermacher was regarded as a highly competent translator and commentator of Plato. Schopenhauer became disillusioned with both thinkers, and with university intellectual life in general, which he regarded as unnecessarily abstruse, removed from genuine philosophical concerns, and compromised by theological agendas.

Napoleon’s Grande Armee arrived in Berlin in 1813, and soon after Schopenhauer moved to Rudolstat, a small town near Weimar, in order to escape the political turmoil. There Schopenhauer wrote his doctoral dissertation, The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, in which he provided a systematic investigation of the principle of sufficient reason. He regarded his project as a response to Kant who, in delineating the categories, neglected to attend to the forms that ground them. The following year Schopenhauer settled in Dresden, hoping that the quiet bucolic surroundings and rich intellectual resources found there would foster the development of his philosophical system. Schopenhauer also began an intense study of Baruch Spinoza, whose notion of natura naturans, a notion that characterized nature as self-activity, became key to the formulation of his account of the will in his mature system.

During his time in Dresden, he wrote On Vision and Colors, the product of his collaboration with Goethe. In this work, he used Goethe’s theory as a starting point in order to provide a theory superior to that of his mentor. Schopenhauer’s relationship with Goethe became strained after Goethe became aware of the publication. During his time in Dresden, Schopenhauer dedicated himself to completing his philosophical system, a system that combined Kant’s transcendental idealism with Schopenhauer’s original insight that the will is the thing-in-itself. He published his major work that expounded this system, The World as Will and Representation, in December of 1818 (with a publication date of 1819). To Schopenhauer’s chagrin, the book made no impression on the public.

In 1820, Schopenhauer was awarded permission to lecture at the University of Berlin. He deliberately, and impudently, scheduled his lectures during the same hour as those of G.W.F. Hegel, who was the most distinguished member of the faculty. Only a handful of students attended Schopenhauer’s lectures while over 200 students attended the lectures of Hegel. Although he remained on the list of lecturers for many years in Berlin, no one showed any further interest in attending his lectures, which only fueled his contempt for academic philosophy.

The following decade was perhaps Schopenhauer’s darkest and least productive. Not only did he suffer from the lack of recognition that his groundbreaking philosophy received, but he also suffered from a variety illnesses. He attempted to make a career as a translator from French and English prose, but these attempts also met with little interest from the outside world. During this time Schopenhauer also lost a lawsuit to the seamstress Caroline Luise Marguet that began in 1821 and was settled five years later. Marguet accused Schopenhauer of beating and kicking her when she refused to leave the antechamber to his apartment. As a result of the suit, Schopenhauer had to pay her 60 thalers annually for the rest of her life.

In 1831, Schopenhauer fled Berlin because of a cholera epidemic (an epidemic that later took the life of Hegel) and settled in Frankfurt am Main, where he remained for the rest of his life. In Frankfurt, he again became productive, publishing a number of works that expounded various points in his philosophical system. He published On the Will in Nature in 1836, which explained how new developments in the physical sciences served as confirmation of his theory of the will. In 1839, he received public recognition for the first time, a prize awarded by the Norwegian Academy, on his essay, On the Freedom of the Human Will. In 1840 he submitted an essay entitled On the Basis of Morality to the Danish Academy, but was awarded no prize even though his essay was the only submission. In 1841, he published both essays under the title, The Fundamental Problems of Morality, and included an introduction that was little more than a scathing indictment of Danish Academy for failing to recognize the value of his insights.

Schopenhauer was able to publish an enlarged second edition to his major work in 1843, which more than doubled the size of the original edition. The new expanded edition earned Schopenhauer no more acclaim than the original work. He published a work of popular philosophical essays and aphorisms aimed at the general public in 1851 under the title, Parerga and Paralipomena (Secondary Works and Belated Observations). This work, the most unlikely of his books, earned him his fame, and from the most unlikely of places: a review written by the English scholar John Oxenford, entitled “Iconoclasm in German Philosophy,” which was translated into German. The review excited an interest in German readers, and Schopenhauer became famous virtually overnight. Schopenhauer spent the rest of his life reveling in his hard won and belated fame, and died in 1860.

2. Schopenhauer’s Thought

Schopenhauer’s philosophy stands apart from other German idealist philosophers in many respects. Perhaps most surprising for the first time reader of Schopenhauer familiar with the writings of other German idealists would be the clarity and elegance of his prose. Schopenhauer was an avid reader of the great stylists in England and France, and he tried to emulate their style in his own writings. Schopenhauer often charged more abstruse writers such as Fichte and Hegel with deliberate obfuscation, describing the latter as a scribbler of nonsense in his second edition of The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason.

Schopenhauer’s philosophy also stands in contrast with his contemporaries insofar as his system remains virtually unchanged from its first articulation in the first edition of The World as Will and Representation. Even his dissertation, which he wrote before he recognized the role of the will in metaphysics, was incorporated into his mature system. For this reason, his thought has been arranged thematically rather than chronologically below.

a. The World as Will and Representation

i. Schopenhauer’s Metaphysics and Epistemology

The starting point for Schopenhauer’s metaphysics is Immanuel Kant’s system of transcendental idealism as explained in The Critique of Pure Reason. Although Schopenhauer is quite critical of much of the content of Kant’s Transcendental Analytic, he endorses Kant’s approach to metaphysics in Kant’s limiting the sphere of metaphysics to articulating the conditions of experience rather than transcending the bounds of experience. In addition, he accepts the results of the Transcendental Aesthetic, which demonstrate the truth of transcendental idealism. Like Kant, Schopenhauer argues that the phenomenal world is a representation, i.e., an object for the subject conditioned by the forms of our cognition. At the same time, Schopenhauer simplifies the activity of the Kantian cognitive apparatus by holding that all cognitive activity occurs according to the principle of sufficient reason, that is, that nothing is without a reason for being.

In Schopenhauer’s dissertation, which was published under the title The Fourfold Root of Sufficient Reason, he argues that all of our representations are connected according to one of the four manifestations of the principle of sufficient reason, each of which concerns a different class of objects. The principle of sufficient reason of becoming, which regards empirical objects, provides an explanation in terms of causal necessity: any material state presupposes a prior state from which it regularly follows. The principle of sufficient reason of knowing, which regards concepts or judgments, provides an explanation in terms of logical necessity: if a judgment is to be true, it must have a sufficient ground. Regarding the third branch of the principle, that of space and time, the ground for being is mathematical: space and time are so constituted that all their parts mutually determine one another. Finally, for the principle regarding willing, we require as a ground a motive, which is an inner cause for that which it was done. Every action presupposes a motive from which it follows by necessity.

Schopenhauer argues that prior philosophers, including Kant, have failed to recognize that the first manifestation and second manifestations are distinct, and subsequently tend to conflate logical grounds and causes. Moreover, philosophers have not heretofore recognized the principle’s operation in the realms of mathematics and human action. Thus Schopenhauer was confident that his dissertation not only would provide an invaluable corrective to prior accounts of the principle of sufficient reason, but would also allow every brand of explanation to acquire greater certainty and precision.

It should be noted that while Schopenhauer’s account of the principle of sufficient reason owes much to Kant’s account of the faculties, his account is significantly at odds with Kant’s in several ways. For Kant, the understanding always operates by means of concepts and judgments, and the faculties of understanding and reason are distinctly human (at least regarding those animate creatures with which we are familiar). Schopenhauer, however, asserts that the understanding is not conceptual and is a faculty that both animals and humans possess. In addition, Schopenhauer’s account of the fourth root of the principle of sufficient reason is at odds with Kant’s account of human freedom, for Schopenhauer argues that actions follow necessarily from their motives.

Schopenhauer incorporates his account of the principle of sufficient reason into the metaphysical system of his chief work, The World as Will and Representation. As we have seen, Schopenhauer, like Kant, holds that representations are always constituted by the forms of our cognition. However, Schopenhauer points out that there is an inner nature to phenomena that eludes the principle of sufficient reason. For example, etiology (the science of physical causes) describes the manner in which causality operates according to the principle of sufficient reason, but it cannot explain the natural forces that underlie and determine physical causality. All such forces remain, to use Schopenhauer’s term, “occult qualities.”

At the same time, there is one aspect of the world that is not given to us merely as representation, and that is our own bodies. We are aware of our bodies as objects in space and time, as a representation among other representations, but we also experience our bodies in quite a different way, as the felt experiences of our own intentional bodily motions (that is, kinesthesis). This felt awareness is distinct from the body’s spatio-temporal representation. Since we have insight into what we ourselves are aside from representation, we can extend this insight to every other representation as well. Thus, Schopenhauer concludes, the innermost nature [Innerste], the underlying force, of every representation and also of the world as a whole is the will, and every representation is an objectification of the will. In short, the will is the thing in itself. Thus Schopenhauer can assert that he has completed Kant’s project because he has successfully identified the thing in itself.

Although every representation is an expression of will, Schopenhauer denies that every item in the world acts intentionally or has consciousness of its own movements. The will is a blind, unconscious force that is present in all of nature. Only in its highest objectifications, that is, only in animals, does this blind force become conscious of its own activity. Although the conscious purposive striving that the term ‘will’ implies is not a fundamental feature of the will, conscious purposive striving is the manner in which we experience it and Schopenhauer chooses the term with this fact in mind.

Hence, the title of Schopenhauer’s major work, The World as Will and Representation, aptly summarizes his metaphysical system. The world is the world of representation, as a spatio-temporal universal of individuated objects, a world constituted by our own cognitive apparatus. At the same time, the inner being of this world, what is outside of our cognitive apparatus or what Kant calls the thing-in-itself, is the will; the original force manifested in every representation.

ii. The Ideas and Schopenhauer’s Aesthetics

Schopenhauer argues that space and time, which are the principles of individuation, are foreign to the thing-in-itself, for they are the modes of our cognition. For us, the will expresses itself in a variety of individuated beings, but the will in itself is an undivided unity. It is the same force at work in our own willing, in the movements of animals, of plants and of inorganic bodies.

Yet, if the world is composed of undifferentiated willing, why does this force manifest itself in such a vast variety of ways? Schopenhauer’s reply is that the will is objectified in a hierarchy of beings. At its lowest grade, we see the will objectified in natural forces, and at its highest grade the will is objectified in the species of human being. The phenomena of higher grades of the will are produced by conflicts occurring between different phenomena of the lower grades of the will, and in the phenomenon of the higher Idea, the lower grades are subsumed. For instance, the laws of chemistry and gravity continue to operate in animals, although such lower grades cannot explain fully their movements. Although Schopenhauer explains the grades of the will in terms of development, he insists that the gradations did not develop over time, for such an understanding would assume that time exists independently of our cognitive faculties. Thus in all natural beings we see the will expressing itself in its various objectifications. Schopenhauer identifies these objectifications with the Platonic Ideas for a number of reasons. They are outside of space and time, related to individual beings as their prototypes, and ontologically prior to the individual beings that correspond to them.

Although the laws of nature presuppose the Ideas, we cannot intuit the Ideas simply by observing the activities of nature, and this is due to the relation of the will to our representations. The will is the thing in itself, but our experience of the will, our representations, are constituted by our form of cognition, the principle of sufficient reason. The principle of sufficient reason produces the world of representation as a nexus of spatio-temporal, causally related entities. Therefore, Schopenhauer’s metaphysical system seems to preclude our having access to the Ideas as they are in themselves, or in a way that transcends this spatio-temporal causally related framework.

However, Schopenhauer asserts that there is a kind of knowing that is free from the principle of sufficient reason. To have knowledge that is not conditioned by our forms of cognition would be an impossibility for Kant. Schopenhauer makes such knowledge possible by distinguishing the conditions of knowing, namely, the principle of sufficient reason, from the condition for objectivity in general. To be an object for a subject is a condition of objects that is more basic than the principle of sufficient reason for Schopenhauer. Since the principle of sufficient reason allows us to experience objects as particulars existing in space and time with a causal relation to other things, to have an experience of an object solely insofar as it presents itself to a subject, apart from the principle of sufficient reason, is to experience an object that is neither spatio-temporal nor in a causal relation to other objects. Such objects are the Ideas, and the kind of cognition involved in perceiving them is aesthetic contemplation, for perception of the Ideas is the experience of the beautiful.

Schopenhauer argues that the ability to transcend the everyday point of view and regard objects of nature aesthetically is not available to most human beings. Rather, the ability to regard nature aesthetically is the hallmark of the genius, and Schopenhauer describes the content of art through an examination of genius. The genius, claims Schopenhauer, is one who has been given by nature a superfluity of intellect over will. For Schopenhauer, the intellect is designed to serve the will. Since in living organisms, the will manifests itself as the drive for self-preservation, the intellect serves individual organisms by regulating their relations with the external world in order to secure their self-preservation. Because the intellect is designed to be entirely in service of the will, it slumbers, to use Schopenhauer’s colorful metaphor, unless the will awakens it and sets it in motion. Therefore ordinary knowledge always concerns the relations, laid down by the principle of sufficient reason, of objects in terms of the demands of the will.

Although the intellect exists only to serve the will, in certain humans the intellect accorded by nature is so disproportionately large, it far exceeds the amount needed to serve the will. In such individuals, the intellect can break free of the will and act independently. A person with such an intellect is a genius (only men can have such a capability according to Schopenhauer), and this will-free activity is aesthetic contemplation or creation. The genius is thus distinguished by his ability to engage in will-less contemplation of the Ideas for a sustained period of time, which allows him to repeat what he has apprehended by creating a work of art. In producing a work of art, the genius makes the beautiful accessible for the non-genius as well. Whereas non-geniuses cannot intuit the Ideas in nature, they can intuit them in a work of art, for the artist replicates nature in the artwork in such a manner that the viewer is capable of viewing it disinterestedly, that is, freed from her own willing, as an Idea.

Schopenhauer states that aesthetic contemplation is characterized by objectivity. The intellect in its normal functioning is in the service of the will. As such, our normal perception is always tainted by our subjective strivings. The aesthetic point of view, since it is freed from such strivings, is more objective than any other ways of regarding an object. Art does not transport the viewer to an imaginary or even ideal realm. Rather it affords the opportunity to view life without the distorting influence of his own will.

b. The Human Will: Agency, Freedom, and Ethical Action

i. Agency and Freedom

Any account of human agency in Schopenhauer must be given in terms of his account of the will. For Schopenhauer, all acts of will are bodily movements, and thus are not the internal cause of bodily movements. What distinguishes an act of will from other events, which are also expressions of the will, is that it meets two criteria: it is a bodily movement caused by a motive, and it is accompanied by a direct awareness of this movement. Schopenhauer provides both a psychological and physiological account of motives. In his psychological account, motives are causes that occur in the medium of cognition, or internal causes. Motives are mental events that arise in response to an awareness of some motivating object. Schopenhauer argues that these mental events can never be desires or emotions: desires and emotions are expressions of the will and thus are not included under the class of representations. Rather, a motive is the awareness of some object of representation. These representations can be abstract; thinking the concept of an object, or intuitive; perceiving an object. Thus Schopenhauer provides a causal picture of action, and it is one in which mental events cause physical events.

In Schopenhauer’s physiological account of motives, motives are brain processes that cause certain neural activities and these translate into bodily motion. The psychological and physical accounts are consistent insofar as Schopenhauer has a dual-aspect view of the mental and physical. The mental and the physical are not two causally linked realms, but two aspects of the same nature, where one cannot be reduced to or explained by the other. It is important to underscore the fact that in the physiological account, the will is not a function of the brain. Rather it is present as irritability in the muscular fibers of the whole body.

According to Schopenhauer, the will, as muscular irritability, is a continual striving for activity in general. Because this striving has no direction, it aims at all directions at once and thus produces no physical movement. However, when the nervous system provides the direction for this movement (that is, when motives act on the will), the movement is given direction and bodily movement occurs. The nerves do not move the muscles, rather they provide the occasion for the muscles’ movements.

The causal mechanism in acts of will is necessary and lawful, as are all causal relations in Schopenhauer’s view. Acts of will follow from motives with the same necessity that the motion of a billiard ball follows from its being struck. Yet this account leads to a problem concerning the unpredictability of acts: if the causal process is law governed, and if acts of will are causally determined, Schopenhauer must account for the fact that human actions are unpredictable. This unpredictability of human action, he argues, is due to the impossibility of knowing comprehensively the character of an individual. Each character is unique, and thus it is impossible to predict fully how a motive or set of motives will effect bodily motion. In addition, we usually do not know what a person’s beliefs are concerning the motive, and these beliefs influence how she will respond to it. However, if we had a full account of a person’s character as well as her beliefs, we could with scientific accuracy predict what bodily motion would result from a particular motive.

Schopenhauer distinguishes between causation that occurs through stimuli, which is mechanistic, and that which occurs through motives. Each kind of causality occurs with necessity and lawfulness. The difference between these different classifications of causes regards the commensurability and proximity of cause and the effect, not their degree of lawfulness. In mechanical causation, the cause is contiguous and commensurate to the effect, both cause and effect are easily perceived, and therefore their causal lawfulness is clear. For instance, a billiard ball must be struck in order to move, and the force in which one ball hits will be equal to the force in which the other ball moves. In stimuli, causes are proximate: there is no separation between receiving the impression and being determined by it. At the same time, cause and effect are not always commensurate: for instance, when a plant reaches up to the sun, the sun as cause makes no motion to produce the effect of the plant’s movement. In motive causality, the cause is neither proximate nor commensurate: the memory of Helen can cause whole armies to run to battle, for instance. Consequently the lawfulness in motive causality is difficult, if not impossible, to perceive.

Because human action is causally determined, Schopenhauer denies that humans can freely choose how they respond to motives. In any course of events, one and only one course of action is available to the agent, and the agent performs that action with necessity. Schopenhauer must, then, account for the fact that agents experience their own actions as contingent. Moreover, he must account for the active nature of agency, the fact that agents experience their actions as things they do and not things that happen to them.

Schopenhauer gives an explanation of the active nature of agency, but not in terms of the causal efficacy of agents. Instead, the key to accounting for human agency lies in the distinction between one’s intelligible and empirical character. Our intelligible character is our character outside of space and time, and is the original force of the will. We cannot have access to our intelligible character, as it exists outside our forms of knowing. Like all forces in nature, it is original, inalterable and inexplicable. Our empirical character is our character insofar as it manifests itself in individual acts of will: it is, in short, the phenomenon of the intelligible character. The empirical character is an object of experience and thus tied to the forms of experience, namely space, time and causality.

However, the intelligible character is not determined by these forms, and thus is free. Schopenhauer calls this freedom transcendental, as it is outside the realm of experience. Although we can have no experience of our intelligible character, we do have some awareness of the fact that our actions issue from it and thus are very much our own. This awareness accounts for our experiencing our deeds as both original and spontaneous. Thus our deeds are both events linked with other events in a lawfully determined causal chain and acts that issue directly from our own characters. Our actions can embody both these otherwise contradictory characterizations because these characterizations refer to the deeds from two different aspects of our characters, the empirical and the intelligible.

Our characters also explain why we attribute moral responsibility to agents even though acts are causally necessitated. Characters determine the consequences that motives effect on our bodies. Yet, states Schopenhauer, our characters are entirely our own: our characters are fundamentally what we are. This is why we assign praise or blame not to acts but to the agents who commit them. And this is why we hold ourselves responsible: not because we could have acted differently given who we are, but that we could have been different from who we are. Although there is not freedom in our action, there is freedom in our essence, our intelligible character, insofar as our essence lies outside the forms of our cognition, that is to say, space, time and causality.

ii. Ethics

Like Kant, Schopenhauer reconciles freedom and necessity in human action through the distinction between the phenomenal and noumenal realms. However, he was sharply critical of Kant’s deontological framework. Schopenhauer charged Kant with committing a petitio principii, for he assumed at the outset of his ethics that purely moral laws and then constructed an ethics to account for such laws. Schopenhauer argues, however, that Kant provides no proof for the existence of such laws. Indeed, Schopenhauer avers that no such laws, which have their basis in theological assumptions, exist. Likewise, Schopenhauer attacks Kant’s account of morality as characterized by an unconditioned ought. The notion of ‘ought’ only carries motivational force when accompanied by the threat of sanctions. Because no ought can be unconditioned insofar as its motivational force stems from its implicit threat of punishment, all imperatives are in fact, according to Schopenhauer, hypothetical.

Nor does Schopenhauer accept Kant’s claim that morality derives from reason: like David Hume, Schopenhauer regards reason as instrumental. The origins of morality are not found in reason, but rather in the feeling of compassion that allows one to transcend the standpoint of egoism. The dictum of morality is “Harm no one and help others as much as you can.” Most persons operate exclusively from egoistic motives, for, as Schopenhauer explains, our knowledge of our own weal and woe is direct, while our knowledge of the weal and woe of others is always only representation and thus does not affect us.

Although most persons are motivated primarily by egoistic concerns, certain rare persons can act from compassion, and it is compassion that forms the basis of Schopenhauer’s ethics. Compassion is prompted by the awareness of the suffering of another person, and Schopenhauer characterizes it as a kind of felt knowledge. Compassion is born of the awareness that individuation is merely phenomenal. Consequently the ethical point of view expresses a deeper knowledge than what is found in the ordinary manner of viewing the world. Indeed, the feeling of compassion is nothing other than the felt knowledge that the suffering of another has a reality equal to one’s own suffering insofar as the world in itself is an undifferentiated unity. Schopenhauer asserts that this knowledge cannot be taught or even communicated, but can only be brought about by experience.

Since compassion is the basis of Schopenhauer’s ethics, the ethical significance of conduct is found in the motive alone, an aspect of his ethics that finds affinity with Kant. Thus Schopenhauer distinguishes the just person from the good person not by the nature of their actions, but by their level of compassion: the just person sees through the principle of individuation enough to avoid causing harm to another, whereas the good person sees through it even further, to the point that the suffering he sees in others touches him almost as closely as does his own. Such a person not only avoids harming others, but actively tries to alleviate the suffering of others. At its highest point, someone may recognize the suffering of others with such clarity that he is willing to sacrifice his own well-being for the sake of others, if by doing so the suffering he will alleviate outweighs the suffering he must endure. This, says Schopenhauer, is the highest point in ethical conduct.

3. Schopenhauer’s Pessimism

Schopenhauer’s pessimism is the most well known feature of his philosophy, and he is often referred to as the philosopher of pessimism. Schopenhauer’s pessimistic vision follows from his account of the inner nature of the world as aimless blind striving.

Because the will has no goal or purpose, the will’s satisfaction is impossible. The will objectifies itself in a hierarchy of gradations from inorganic to organic life, and every grade of objectification of the will, from gravity to animal motion, is marked by insatiable striving. In addition, every force of nature and every organic form of nature participates in a struggle to seize matter from other forces or organisms. Thus existence is marked by conflict, struggle and dissatisfaction.

The attainment of a goal or desire, Schopenhauer continues, results in satisfaction, whereas the frustration of such attainment results in suffering. Since existence is marked by want or deficiency, and since satisfaction of this want is unsustainable, existence is characterized by suffering. This conclusion holds for all of nature, including inanimate natures, insofar as they are at essence will. However, suffering is more conspicuous in the life of human beings because of their intellectual capacities. Rather than serving as a relief from suffering, the intellect of human beings brings home their suffering with greater clarity and consciousness. Even with the use of reason, human beings can in no way alter the degree of misery we experience; indeed, reason only magnifies the degree to which we suffer. Thus all the ordinary pursuits of mankind are not only fruitless but also illusory insofar as they are oriented toward satisfying an insatiable, blind will.

Since the essence of existence is insatiable striving, and insatiable striving is suffering, Schopenhauer concludes that nonexistence is preferable to existence. However, suicide is not the answer. One cannot resolve the problem of existence through suicide, for since all existence is suffering, death does not end one’s suffering but only terminates the form that one’s suffering takes. The proper response to recognizing that all existence is suffering is to turn away from or renounce one’s own desiring. In this respect, Schopenhauer’s thought finds confirmation in the Eastern texts he read and admired: the goal of human life is to turn away from desire. Salvation can only be found in resignation.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources Available in English

  • Manuscript Remains in Four Volumes. Edited by Arthur Hübscher, Translated by E.F.J. Payne. Oxford: Berg Publishers, 1988.
  • On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason. Translated by E.F.J. Payne. LaSalle: Open Court Press, 1997.
  • On the Basis of Morality. Translated by E.F.J. Payne. Indianapolis: The Bobbs Merrill Company, 1965.
  • On the Will in Nature. Translated by E.F.J. Payne, Edited by David Cartwright. New York: Berg Publishers, 1992.
  • Parerga and Paralipomena Volumes 1 and II. Translated by E.F.J. Payne. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Prize Essay on the Freedom of the Will. Edited by Gunther Zoller, Translated by E.F. J. Payne. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • The World as Will and Representation. Translated by E.F.J. Payne, 2 vols. New York: Dover, 1969.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Atwell, John E. Schopenhauer: The Human Character . Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1990.
    • Provides a lucid account of Schopenhauer’s ethics and pessimism.
  • Atwell, John E. Schopenhauer on the Character of the World: The Metaphysics of Will. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1995.
    • An excellent and comprehensive account of Schopenhauer’s metaphysics and epistemology that brings new insight into Schopenhauer’s methodology.
  • Cartwright, David E. Schopenhauer: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
    • The most comprehensive biography of Schopenhauer available in English.
  • Copleston, Frederick. Arthur Schopenhauer, Philosopher of Pessimism. London: Barnes and Noble, 1975.
    • The first book length monograph on Schopenhauer written in English.
  • Hamlyn, D.W. Schopenhauer. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1980.
    • A brief but substantive critical analysis of his thought that includes a strong summary of his dissertation as well as his relationship to Kant.
  • Hübscher, Arthur, The Philosophy of Schopenhauer in Its Intellectual Context: Thinker Against the Tide. Translated by Joachim T. Baer and David E. Cartwright. Lewiston, N.Y : Edwin Mellon Press, 1989.
    • An excellent intellectual biography, extensively covers his earliest (pre-dissertation) thought and the influences of German romanticism and idealism.
  • Jacquette, Dale, ed. Schopenhauer, Philosophy, and the Arts. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
    • A collection of essays on both Schopenhauer’s aesthetics and the influence his aesthetics had on later artists.
  • Janaway, Christopher, ed. Willing and Nothingness: Schopenhauer as Nietzsche’s Educator. Oxford; Clarendon Press, 1998.
    • These essays explore Schopenhauer’s influence on Nietzsche. The book includes a complete list of textual references to Schopenhauer in Nietzsche’s writings.
  • Magee, Bryan. The Philosophy of Schopenhauer. Oxford: Carendon Press, 1983.
    • Covers the whole of Schopenhauer’s thought, as well as an extensive account on his influence on later thinkers and artists such as Wagner and Wittgenstein.
  • Safranski, Ruediger, Schopenhauer and the Wild Years of Philosophy. Translated by Ewald Osers, London: Weidenfeld and Nicolson, 1989.
    • An entertaining biography that provides insight into the political and cultural milieu in which Schopenhauer developed his thought.
  • Young, Julian, Willing and Unwilling: A Study in the Philosophy of Arthur Schopenhauer. Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff, 1987.
    • An influential reading of Schopenhauer’s work, which argues that Schopenhauer’s account of the thing-in-itself cannot be wholly identified with the will.

Author Information

Mary Troxell
Boston College
U. S. A.

Epistemic Entitlement

In the early 1990s there emerged a growing interest with the concept of epistemic entitlement. Philosophers who acknowledge the existence of entitlements maintain that there are beliefs or judgments unsupported by evidence available to the subject, but which the subject nonetheless has the epistemic right to hold. Some of these may include beliefs non-inferentially sourced in perception, memory, introspection, testimony, and the a priori.  Unlike the traditional notion of justification, entitlement is often characterized as an externalist type of epistemic warrant, in the sense that a subject’s being entitled is determined by facts and circumstances that are independent of any reasoning capacities she may or may not have, and which the subject herself need not understand or be able to recognize. One key motivation for this view is that the inclusion of entitlement in epistemology can account for the commonly held intuition that largely unreflective individuals, such as children and non-human animals, possess warrant and basic knowledge about the world.  It also paves the way for a tenable foundationalist epistemology, according to which there exist warranted beliefs which are not themselves warranted or justified by any further beliefs.  This article explores theories of entitlement as presented by four prominent philosophers: Fred Dretske, Tyler Burge, Crispin Wright, and Christopher Peacocke.

Table of Contents

  1. Dretske on Entitlement
  2. Burge on Entitlement
  3. Wright on Entitlement
  4. Peacocke on Entitlement
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Dretske on Entitlement

Fred Dretske has argued for the existence of epistemic entitlements.  Like justification, entitlement is an epistemic property of belief which, when the belief is true (and the subject is not in a Gettier-style situation), constitutes knowledge.  Much of Dretske’s work on this topic rises out of his (2000) article: “Entitlements: Epistemic Rights without Epistemic Duties?”  Part of understanding his view involves having a grasp of the question being posed in the article’s title.  Unlike justifications, entitlements are epistemic rights we have to believe various propositions without having any added requirements to engage, or be able to engage, in some sophisticated mental exercise.  Considering what is included in the conception of justification, the traditional answer suggests that being justified is a matter of fulfilling various epistemic duties or obligations.  Some of these duties may include: gathering ample evidence, arriving at beliefs carefully and methodically, deliberating over the strength of one’s supportive reasons, and so forth.  For instance, if it is true that Detective Johnson is justified in believing

GUILTY: Smith is guilty of the murder,

then it must be that she has good reasons for thinking GUILTY true, reasons of which she herself is aware and could appeal to if she needed to defend her belief.  Johnson's reasons may be, for example, that Smith’s fingerprints were on the murder weapon and Smith had strong motive to kill.  Though these sorts of epistemic requirements obtain for beliefs like GUILTY (as we shall assume), Dretske thinks there are other sorts of beliefs you and I have which: (1) amount to genuine knowledge, but that also (2) are not justified in the sense just described.  Consider your perceptual belief that

BRIGHT: There is a bright screen ahead of me,

or a memorial belief that

ATE: I ate breakfast this morning.

Given that you know these propositions, it seems too strong a condition that you must recognize that which provides the epistemic support for these beliefs, or be in a position to defend them by way of some argument.  Additionally, many philosophers think that children and lower animals have perceptual and memorial knowledge, yet they lack the conceptual skills needed to be able to think about what it is that gives them this knowledge.  The point is that the conditions for acquiring a justification for a belief like GUILTY are harder to satisfy than they are for acquiring an entitlement for a belief like BRIGHT.  Thus, Dretske holds that there exists a kind of epistemic good that attaches to our various perceptual beliefs and memorial beliefs (and perhaps others) but which is distinct from the traditional notion of justification.  This epistemic good is what he calls entitlement.  To have an entitlement is to have the epistemic right to believe a proposition in which the possessor need not be consciously reflective of that which awards the entitlement.  (Notice that the relevant kinds of beliefs Dretske has in mind, like BRIGHT or ATE, are about things in the outer world, not our own conscious experiences or memories.)

In this way epistemic entitlements are analogous to various legal or constitutional rights we have.  There is no added physical effort or labor you had to exert to be awarded the right to vote in the U.S. presidential election; you have this right solely in virtue of having the status of being a U.S. citizen and at least eighteen years old.  Indeed, you have this right whether or not you know that you do.  The same goes for one’s right to the property bequeathed by a passing family member.  The recipient did not have to do anything to “earn” her entitlement to that property; that she is simply listed in the will suffices.  Similarly, what gives people the epistemic right, or entitlement, to hold various beliefs is determined by circumstances independent of any reasoning capacities they may or may not have.  A subject may have an entitlement to her belief even if she is unaware that she has it.

Before proceeding, note that Dretske is operating with a narrow characterization of justification.  He thinks that justification is an epistemically internalist notion in the sense that to be justified in holding a belief, there must be some proposition (or propositions) one already believes and which one has reflective access to and could be used to justify that belief.  On the other hand, entitlement receives an externalist characterization in the sense that one can have an entitlement without having access to that which makes one entitled.  It is worth mentioning, however, that not all epistemologists understand justification in the way Dretske does.  Whereas for Dretske, the things that do the justifying are other beliefs one has, some internalists allow other sorts of mental states, like perceptual experiences and memories, to count as reasons or justifications (Audi 1993 and Pryor 2000).  Also, some philosophers prefer to use ‘internalism’ simply as the claim that the things that justify a belief are internal to one’s mental life.  One could be an internalist about justification in this weaker sense, which is commonly referred to as mentalism (see Conee and Feldman 2003), without requiring that one be able to access or become aware of one’s justifying mental states or to believe that these states are reliable.  Thus, according to a mentalist, a child may be justified in believing BRIGHT, provided that it is properly grounded in her experience of a bright screen ahead, even if the child does not herself recognize her experience as that which makes her justified.  The point is that Dretskean entitlement, if it is a distinctive epistemic concept, differs from justification only as understood in Dretske’s restricted sense of the term as that of being backed by other beliefs to which one could appeal in support of one’s belief.

The main question Dretske wishes to answer is: if there are things we are entitled to accept as true, what grounds this entitlement?  In other words, what entitles us to believe various propositions?  It is important to emphasize that these are questions posed specifically to philosophers; entitled subjects themselves need not know, and quite often do not know, the answer to them.  Dretske begins his answer by distancing his view of entitlement from a pure reliabilist view that one has the epistemic right to the belief that p if and only if the belief that p was produced by a reliable process.  For a pure reliabilist, given that your perceptual system produced your belief that BRIGHT, and assuming that perception yields true beliefs on most occasions, you are epistemically permitted to hold this belief.  But according to Dretske, there are (at least) two reasons why entitlement must not be associated with this form of reliabilism.  First, one can surely hold what is in fact a reliably-produced belief while at the same time having independent reasons for doubting its truth (for example, you have evidence that you’ve taken a mind-altering drug, yet you continue to trust your senses as they indicate a three-foot bumble bee).  To maintain the belief in such a situation would, intuitively, be irrational on the subject’s part, which, it seems, would thereby strip the subject of her epistemic right to that belief.  However, by concentrating entirely on the reliability of a belief-forming process, a pure reliabilist cannot accommodate this intuition.  Entitlement must therefore be understood as a defeasible epistemic right, one that can be defeated by countervailing evidence.  Secondly, Dretske holds that entitlements supervene on the subjective resources of the subject.  This implies that two subjects with identical psychological make-ups cannot differ with respect to the entitlements they possess (For this reason, it is plausible that Dretskean entitlement has an element of internalism, but only of the weaker, mentalist sort described above).  For example, suppose there is some being who has the exact same experiences, beliefs, methods of reasoning, and so forth, as you do.  Suppose further that this “mental twin” of yours is, unbeknownst to her, nothing but a bodiless brain in a vat whose experiences are systematically being fed by a powerful supercomputer.  While your perceptual system is highly reliable (as we shall assume), your twin’s system is massively unreliable, because all of her experiences and corresponding beliefs are erroneous.  According to a pure reliabilist, then, whereas you have the epistemic right to believe BRIGHT when you have an experience of a bright screen before you, your envatted twin lacks the right to BRIGHT when she has the exact same experience.  Dretske, however, thinks that this is the wrong result. (The sort of case described here is commonly referred to as the New Evil Demon Problem, first introduced by Lehrer & Cohen 1983.)  He thinks it is intuitively correct that your twin has the right to believe whatever you have a right to believe, even if your beliefs are true and her’s false.  You have knowledge and your twin lacks it because knowledge requires truth and your twin’s beliefs are false; however, it seems that the unfortunate twin still retains some epistemic good.  The correct account of entitlement should allow for this intuition and therefore be suited to award entitlements to subjects who are in unfavorable, illusory environments. (Although the New Evil Demon Problem does pose a challenge to the pure version of reliabilism Dretske considers, it bears mentioning that several philosophers have advanced other versions of reliabilism which purport to avoid this problem.  See, for instance, Bach 1985, Goldman 1988, Comesaña 2002, Majors and Sawyer 2005.)

If the concept of entitlement is not grounded in the reliability of a belief-forming process, what is it grounded in?  Dretske argues that we have entitlements to beliefs which are psychologically immediate and irresistible to us.  There are certain sorts of beliefs over which we have no choice whether we hold them or not.  Perceptual beliefs are a prime example.  As you gaze your eyes on a computer screen, your visual experience of a bright screen causes you to believe BRIGHT.  The causal sequence between experience and belief is simply out of your control, and it occurs much too quickly to avoid it.  This fact about our psychologies, that we cannot resist some of our beliefs, is what accounts for our entitlements.  As Dretske says, “We have a right to accept what we are powerless to reject” (2000, p. 598).  In saying this, Dretske appeals to the well-known principle that ‘Ought implies Can’.  Given that you are unable to refrain from believing BRIGHT, it would be unreasonable to suppose that you epistemically ought not to believe it.  If this is correct, then we can see how your brain-in-a-vat twin is entitled to believe BRIGHT.  Although her experience of the screen is inaccurate, and her perceptual system is unreliable, she enjoys an entitlement to her belief because she is equally as compelled to form the belief as you are.

Entitlements are defeated when the formation of a belief is avoidable, that is, when there are things the subject could have done, or more precisely, should have done that would have prevented her from being caused to believe.  Suppose, for example, that you have independent evidence from a credible source that you are now looking at a well-crafted poster of a computer screen instead of a real one.  Suppose further that you disregard this evidence, so that when you have the experience of a bright screen you are caused to believe BRIGHT.  In this sort of case you lack an entitlement to this belief, because had you been properly responsive to the evidence in your possession, your experience would have failed to cause you to believe BRIGHT.  One might interject here that this suggestion runs contrary to Dretske’s original proposal, because even though you have ignored the countervailing evidence, you still cannot avoid being compelled to believe BRIGHT when you had the experience.  In response, Dretske maintains that entitlements should be reserved only for those beliefs that an epistemically responsible agent could not avoid being caused to form in similar circumstances.  Because of this, given that you have this evidence, you epistemically ought to refrain from believing BRIGHT.  Analogously, when a drunk driver accidentally runs over a child in the street, it may be that the driver is, at that time, in a situation where hitting the child was unavoidable.  We do not say, though, that the driver therefore had the right to run over the child.  The reason the driver is culpable for the accident is that were she more responsible, she would have taken measures to ensure that she did not get into the situation in the first place (for example, by taking a taxi home rather than driving).  Similarly, even if you cannot avoid being caused by your experience to believe BRIGHT, your entitlement to that belief is stripped because a responsible agent in that same circumstance, recognizing that she has evidence that she is looking at a computer-screen poster, would have avoided being so caused.

We will now consider two objections to Dretske’s view.  First, Michael Williams (2000) rejects Dretske’s contention that epistemic rights can exist in the complete absence of any epistemic duties.  Given that Dretske takes entitlements to be defeasible rights, it is plausible that were one’s belief challenged by another person, that would cancel the entitlement one had to that belief.  The only way to re-establish the entitlement, it seems, would be by providing reasons that defeat the challenge.  If this is right, it suggests that Dretske overstates his position that entitlements are completely free of justificational obligations.  While it may be correct that we need not actively provide positive evidential backing for every belief to which we are entitled, having an entitlement requires that one at least be able to justify or defend one’s belief in situations when one is presented with an appropriate challenge.  As Williams notes, defeasibility and justificational commitments go together.  The result, presumably, is that most young children and unreflective adults would lack entitlements to many of their perceptual and memorial beliefs, for they may lack the cognitive resources needed to be able to defend their own beliefs. However, this is a result some philosophers are willing to accept.

As for the second objection, many philosophers think that insofar as entitlements are epistemic goods that contribute to knowledge, they must be suitably connected to truth; they must be truth-conducive, or have a sufficiently high likelihood of being true.  But this suggestion appears to be at odds with Dretske’s claim that your brain-in-a-vat mental twin, whose beliefs are almost all false, is entitled to the same beliefs that you are.  One way epistemologists sometimes react to the New Evil Demon Problem is to draw a distinction between two kinds of epistemic standings: being epistemically blameless for holding a belief, on the one hand, and being fully entitled (or justified or warranted) in holding a belief, such that having this property makes an essential contribution to knowledge, on the other (see Pryor 2001).  According to this distinction, whereas you are entitled to the belief (and also know) that BRIGHT, your envatted twin is merely blameless when she forms the same belief.  It is through no fault of her own that she arrives at a false, unreliably-produced belief; nonetheless, she lacks an epistemic right which you possess.  She is simply unlucky that her experiences and beliefs are not connected to the external world in the proper way.

In response to this charge, one could claim that the envatted subject’s beliefs are conducive to truth, but only relative to more favorable environments (see Goldman 1986 and Henderson & Horgan 2006).  Given that the brain in a vat is a responsible agent, her beliefs would be mostly true if she were in an environment similar to the actual one.  Alternatively, one could deny that a distinction between being blameless and being entitled (or justified or warranted) exists at all.  The suggestion would be that to be justly entitled is for you (or an epistemically responsible agent) to be blameless in holding the belief (for defenders of this move see Ginet 1975, Chisholm 1977, and Bonjour 1985; for objections see Alston 1989a).  Whether either of these options have promise, however, is something that Dretske would need to argue for.

2. Burge on Entitlement

Tyler Burge has argued that “[w]e are entitled to rely, other things equal, on perception, memory, deductive and inductive reasoning, and on…the word of others” (1993, p. 458).  Because his work on perceptual entitlement is arguably the most developed, we shall focus our attention on perceptual beliefs: beliefs non-inferentially based on a perceptual experience.

Burge begins by introducing the concept of warrant, which he says is the most fundamental type of epistemic good.  What makes it specifically an epistemic good is that a belief’s being warranted depends first and foremost on its being a good route to truth.  Yet, it also depends on the subject’s own limitations: what information the subject has; what information is available; and how well that information is used.  Thus, when he says warrant must be a good route to truth, he does not mean that warranted beliefs necessarily are true; one can be warranted in a belief which happens to be false.  Nonetheless, the warranted subject must, at a minimum, be well-positioned to achieve truth.  Being warranted entails being reliable, that is, the productive warranted belief has a sufficiently high likelihood of being true (at least under normal circumstances).

Warrant is divided into two sub-species.  The first is justification.  Justification is epistemically internalist in the sense that it is warrant by reason that is conceptually accessible upon reflection to the subject.  Beliefs we are justified in holding are those that result from having engaged in reasoning or from having drawn an inference from other beliefs (Consider again the example from the previous section in which Johnson infers that Smith is guilty on the basis of her reasons that Smith’s fingerprints were on the murder weapon and he had motive to kill).  But when we turn to the epistemology of perceptual belief, Burge thinks the transition from a perceptual state (for example, seeing a round and red apple on the table) to a belief (for example, APPLE: There is round and red apple there) is nothing at all like drawing an inference.  In most typical situations, we do not reason our way from experience to belief; hence the warrant for our perceptual beliefs must not come in the form of justification.  There are two primary reasons why Burge thinks this is so.  First, reasoning is a sophisticated, intellectual mental exercise.  The capacities necessary for reasoning are too complex for us to plausibly attribute them to certain groups of individuals, like children and higher non-human animals.  If justification were the only form of warrant that there is, these individuals’ perceptual beliefs would lack warrant; yet it is commonly thought that these individuals are no less warranted in their perceptual beliefs than mature adults are.  The second reason why it’s wrong to think we reason from experience to belief is that reasoning essentially involves progressing from one or more propositional attitudes one has, like a belief, to another as one would draw a conclusion from the premises of an argument.  But Burge argues that perceptual states are not propositional attitudes.  In other words, perception has nonpropositional content (see also Evans 1982, Peacock 2001, Heck 2007).  Whereas a belief’s content (or what that belief concerns or is about) has predicational (or sentence-like) structure, perceptual content does not.  The content of a perceptual state is more akin to a topographical map rather than a sentence. (For more on nonpropositional perceptual content, see Peacocke 1992.) Therefore, unlike beliefs, experiences are not the kinds of mental states from which one can draw inferences.  Nonetheless, what is common among beliefs and perceptual states, and unlike other kinds of mental states like wishes and imaginings, is that they are both capable of being veridical: they have accuracy conditions that can be either satisfied or unsatisfied.

Given that perceptual beliefs are not justified in the sense just described, the type of warrant they receive must come under a different form.  This brings us to the second sub-species of warrant: entitlement.  Burgean entitlement is epistemically externalist in the sense that it is warrant that need not be fully conceptually accessible to the subject.  Like Dretskean entitlement, one can have a Burgean entitlement to a perceptual belief, such as APPLE, without knowing or justifiably believing that one does.  Also similar to Dretske’s view is the claim that entitlement is a defeasible kind of epistemic good: it can be defeated by independent reasons one may have for doubting that one’s perceptual faculties are properly functioning or that the believed proposition in question is true.  Thus, absent reasons for doubt, one has an entitlement to conceptualize one’s perceptual experience in the form of a belief (for example, to believe APPLE when one has an experience of a round, red apple).

As one clarification, Burge’s claim is not that entitlement is the only kind of warrant that can attach to perceptual beliefs.  People certainly can, and do, reason and deliberate about these sorts of beliefs.  One can think, for example: “There appears to be a round and red apple, and when things appear this way they generally turn out to be accurate.  Therefore, there is a round and red apple there.”  This is a perfectly permissible way to reason, and doing so can result in acquiring a justification in addition to the perceptual entitlement one already possesses.  The crucial point is that securing a warrant for this belief does not require that one reasons, or be able to reason, in this way.  To impose such a requirement on all forms of warrant would result, as Burge says, in hyper-intellectualizing perceptual belief.

The key question Burge wants to answer is: What is the contribution of perceptual states per se to entitlements to perceptual beliefs?  He thinks that two conditions must be met in order for a perceptual state to award the subject the epistemic right to believe as that state represents the world as being.  To understand what these conditions are, it is important first to appreciate Burge’s claim that the perceptual system has a characteristic function.  Some philosophers have argued that the function of any natural system can only be understood in terms of how it contributes to meeting the basic biological needs of the organism (see Millikan 1984).  For example, on this view the perceptual system functions well only insofar as it enables the perceiver to identify mates, avoid predators, find food, and so on.  Burge, however, distances himself from this sort of explanation.  He holds instead that it is known on a priori grounds that the perceptual system is a representational system that has the function to represent the subject’s environment veridically and reliably (2003, p. 508).  Although he agrees that reliable perception can, and oftentimes does, contribute to satisfying one’s biological needs (for example, being able to perceptually discriminate different colors can help one spot red berries to eat in a green forest), it is a mistake for philosophers to attempt to reduce the perceptual system’s function or explain it solely in terms of biological fitness.  The sense in which the perceptual system “has done a good job” in a given situation should be evaluated in terms of its capacity for producing veridical perceptual states.

Provided that this is the perceptual system’s function, there is the further question of how the system is capable of producing states that accurately represent the environment.  Burge’s answer centers on the thesis of perceptual anti-individualism (sometimes called perceptual content externalism).  According to this thesis, the nature of a perceptual state (what that state represents) is partially determined by a history of causal interactions that have occurred between objects and properties in the environment, on the one hand, and the perceiver, or the perceiver’s evolutionary ancestors, on the other (see Burge 2003; 2005, Section I; 2007, Introduction; 2007a).  What explains the fact that you are capable of (accurately or inaccurately) perceptually representing, say, shapes like roundness and colors like redness in the environment is that you, within your own lifetime, or your ancestors throughout the evolution of the species, regularly came into contact with various features in the environment, such as instances of these very shapes and colors.  According to the view, these causal interactions help to establish the principles that govern the formation of the perceptual system’s states and inform the perceptual system of what it ought to represent when it is presented, in a given situation, with some array of stimuli (for example, light waves impacting the retina in the eyes or sound waves impacting the ear drums).

Thus one of the conditions that must be met for a perceptual state to confer an entitlement to a corresponding perceptual belief is that the state is anti-individualistically individuated.  The other condition is as follows: one has an entitlement to believe as one’s perceptual state represents the environment as being, only if that type of perceptual state is reliably veridical in the subject’s normal environment.  Burge defines the normal environment as the one in which the contents of the subject’s perceptual states are established.  What this means is that for those perceptual states that do deliver entitlements, the existence of those types of perceptual states (for example, a state indicating roundness or redness) is explained by a history of causal interactions that were highly successful.  That is, one has the general ability to perceptually represent property F because the perceptual system, in its evolutionary development, regularly confronted instances of F-ness in the environment.  Thus, the normal environment might be where one currently lives, but it need not be.  It is possible that the environment a subject currently lives in is different from the one in which her perceptual system evolved, where she, or her ancestors, first acquired the abilities to represent various objects and properties.

The reason why this second condition is important is that entitlement, insofar as it is a type of epistemic warrant, must be a good route to truth.  Provided that perceptual states are established by high degrees of successful interactions with features in the environment, and hence are reliably veridical in the normal environment, “[v]eridicality enters into the very nature of perceptual states and abilities.” (Burge 2003, p. 532) To rely on a particular perceptual state the general type of which was established in this fashion in the formation of a belief makes it likely that that belief is true in the normal environment.

Burge goes on to argue that when these two conditions are met (that is, the perceptual state is anti-individualistically individuated and it is reliably veridical in the normal environment) one has a defeasible entitlement to rely on that state in any environment.  This further point provides a novel solution to the New Evil Demon Problem, which was discussed in the previous section.  Recall that this problem draws on a commonly held intuition that subjects in skeptical situations can hold warranted beliefs.  Suppose you are a regular embodied person, and an apple on the table causes you to have a perceptual experience of a round and red apple, which subsequently causes you to believe APPLE.  At the very next instant you are unknowingly transported to a different world where your brain is placed in a vat, and a computer produces the same experiences you were just having in your regular embodied state.  You have the exact same experience of a round and red apple, except that now the experience is inaccurate (there are no apples nearby, just other brains and computer equipment).  Not only is your belief false, it was produced by an unreliable process relative to this new environment.  Nevertheless, you still possess an entitlement to this belief, because the perceptual state that produced it (that is, your experience of the round and red apple) is reliably veridical, relative to the normal environment.  Because it was interactions with genuine apples (in the actual world) and instances of roundness and redness that helped to establish this type of perceptual state, you retain the epistemic right to believe as your experience represents, even though it is currently not at all indicative of what is going on in this new hostile environment.

We will now consider two criticisms of Burgean entitlement.  As for the first criticism, Burge states explicitly that his view of entitlement is not meant to speak to the problem of skepticism.  His objective is not to prove that we have perceptual entitlements, but rather to explain on the assumption that we do have them what they are.  But some epistemologists might urge that skepticism needs to be addressed in order to get his view off the ground.  Skeptical issues have typically been raised in connection with epistemic closure, which states roughly:

(Closure)    If subject S is warranted in believing that p, and S knows that p logically entails q, and S deduces q on the basis of p, then S is warranted in believing that q.

Suppose I have a warrant in the form of a Burgean perceptual entitlement to believe HAND (that I have hands).  HAND logically entails ~BIV (that I am not a handless brain in a vat).  According to Closure, I would be warranted in believing ~BIV were I to deduce it from HAND.  But many think this procedure makes it much too easy to secure warrant for beliefs like ~BIV.  It is unclear what Burge’s position on this matter is, but it is something he may need to speak to if his view is to be tenable.  Note finally that Dretske is not faced with the same problem, because he rejects closure altogether (Dretske 2005).

A different sort of criticism has to do with whether there is any real conceptual difference between how Burge characterizes entitlement and how other epistemologists have characterized justification.  Albert Casullo (2009) argues that there is not.  As we have seen, the chief distinction between justification and entitlement, according to Burge, is:

(ACC) Justification is warrant that is conceptually accessible to the subject, and entitlement is warrant that need not be conceptually accessible to the subject.

It is not immediately clear, says Casullo, what is meant by the term ‘access’ or ‘accessible’, and he suggests three possible interpretations:

A1) Subject S has access to the warrant for S’s belief that p if S has access to the epistemic ground that warrants S’s belief, that is, to the content of S’s warranting experience or belief.

A2) S has access to the warrant for S’s belief that p if S has access to the adequacy of that ground, that is, to the justification for the belief that S’s ground is adequate to warrant the belief that p.

A3) S has access to the warrant for S’s belief that p if S has access to the epistemic principle governing the ground of S’s belief that p, that is, to the conditions under which the ground warrants the belief that p and the conditions under which that warrant is undermined.

Bearing these separate interpretations in mind, Casullo provides textual evidence from Burge’s works that ACC should be read as claiming that justification satisfies A1 and A3 but not A2, whereas entitlement satisfies A1 but not A2 or A3.  But if this is the sense in which entitlements need not be accessible to the subject, this is just the view William Alston (1989b) had already proposed, which he calls an internalist externalism account of justification.  Thus, Casullo contends that any differences that exist between Burgean entitlement and Alstonian justification are terminological at best.

3. Wright on Entitlement

Crispin Wright’s approach to entitlement is motivated primarily by an attempt to ward off skeptical paradoxes.  In his (2004) paper, “Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free)?” he introduces the notion of a “cornerstone proposition” for a given region of thought, according to which “it would follow from a lack of warrant for it that one could not rationally claim warrant for any belief in that region” (p. 167-68).  The skeptical project involves two steps: (1) make a case that a certain proposition, which we characteristically accept, is a cornerstone for a much wider class of belief, and (2) argue that we lack warrant for that proposition.  Wright then identifies two general patterns of skeptical reasoning that deploy these two steps.  The first comes from the Cartesian skeptic, who argues that the proposition that we are not cognitively detached from reality (instances of which come in the more common skeptical-scenario varieties like ‘I am not dreaming’ or ‘I am not a brain in a vat’, and so forth) is a cornerstone proposition for our ordinary perceptual beliefs. As for this latter claim, the skeptic reasons that for any procedure one might utilize to try to determine, say, that one is not dreaming (for example, pinching oneself or trying to read the lines of a newspaper), one must already have an independent warrant for thinking that the procedure was executed properly, and moreover that one did not simply dream carrying it out.  But since utilizing any such procedure would require that one already have warrant for believing that one is not dreaming, there is no procedure one could effectively utilize to gain a warrant for this proposition.  Thus, our perceptual beliefs are unwarranted.

The second kind of skeptic, the Humean skeptic, reveals an implicit circularity embedded in our practices of inductive reasoning, where the observance of facts about a sample population causes us to make a claim about all of the population’s members (for example, the inference from ‘All observed Fs are G’ to ‘All Fs are G’).  The inductive inference relies on one’s being warranted in accepting a cornerstone proposition, which Wright calls the Uniformity Thesis: that nature abounds in regularities.  However, there is no way to gain warrant for the Uniformity Thesis, because this could only be accomplished by relying on induction itself (For an overview of the Humean Problem of Induction, see Stroud 1977).

According to Wright, the skeptical problem can be generalized in the following way:  Let P be a proposition representing some feature of observable reality (for example, ‘I have hands’), where the best and as the skeptic will argue only evidence in favor of P is rooted in perceptual experience.  To arrive at an anti-skeptical conclusion, one will typically deploy what Wright calls the I-II-III argument:

I: My current experience is in all respects as if P


III: There is a material world

The same argumentative structure can be utilized to refute skepticisms of a variety of subject matters.  For instance, where I stands for ‘X’s behavior and physical condition are in all respects as if X is in mental state M’, III stands for ‘There are minds besides my own’.  Or where I stands for ‘I seem to remember it being the case that P yesterday’, III stands for ‘The world did not come into being today replete with apparent traces of a more extended history’.  Although the I-II-III argument may appear to warrant the conclusion, Wright contests that it engenders a failure of warrant transmission, a notion he has developed (2003).  According to Wright, it is oftentimes the case that a body of evidence e is an information-dependent warrant for a proposition P, where e is an information-dependent warrant for P if whether e is correctly regarded as warranting P depends on what one has by way of collateral information C.  In cases where C is entailed by P, the warrant for P (which is sourced in e) would fail to transmit to C, were one to infer C from P.  Setting the skeptical problem aside for the moment, consider one of Wright’s own examples.  Suppose that e is your experience of seeing a ball kicked into a net, from which you infer P, the proposition that a goal has just been scored.  Let C be the proposition that a soccer game is in progress.  Now, although C is a logical consequence of P, were you to start with e and infer P and subsequently deduce C, this chain of reasoning could not provide you with any new warrant for believing C, because e’s warranting you in believing P presupposes that you already have a warrant for believing C.  That is, the warrant for P fails to transmit to C because P cannot be warranted (by e) unless C is something for which you already have warrant.

Returning to the anti-skeptical I-II-III argument, Wright claims that III (‘There is an external world’) is a cornerstone proposition for a range of observation-sourced propositions which may be expressed by II (for example, ‘I have hands’).  The point is that whether I successfully warrants II depends on one’s already having warrant for III.  But the warrant for III cannot come by way of the I-II-III argument.  One crucial difference between this situation and the soccer example is that whereas there are means by which you can secure independent warrant for the proposition that a soccer game is in progress (you can, for example, look up the start time of the game in the local newspaper), there appears to be no way to acquire warrant, independent of one’s experiential evidence, for the proposition that there is an external world.  The skeptic will therefore conclude that type-III propositions are unwarranted, and as they are cornerstones so are the associated type-II propositions.

Wright’s aim is not to defend but rather to alleviate skeptical worries.  His strategy is to argue that we do possess warrant for type-III cornerstone propositions, but that warrant does not come in the form of evidential justification, as the skeptic assumes it must.  He says:

Suppose there is a type of rational warrant which one does not have to do any specific evidential work to earn: better, a type of rational warrant whose possession does not require the existence of evidence in the broadest sense encompassing both a priori and empirical considerations for the truth of the warranted proposition.  Call it entitlement.  If I am entitled to accept P, then my doing so is beyond rational reproach even though I can point to no cognitive accomplishment in my life, whether empirical or a priori, inferential or non-inferential, whose upshot could reasonably be contended to be that I had come to know that P, or had succeeded in getting evidence justifying P (2004, p. 174-75).

According to Wright, we have entitlements to accept various cornerstone propositions, such as: ‘There is an external world’; ‘There are other minds’; ‘The world has an ancient past’; and ‘There are regularities present in nature’.  Entitlement is a kind of rational warrant that, unlike justification, does not depend on one’s having evidence one could point to that would speak to the truth of the proposition in question.  Whereas Detective Johnson’s believing that Smith is guilty of the murder is underwritten by her own cognitive accomplishment, by way of basing that belief on recognizable empirical evidence (see Section I above), and is therefore justified, entitlements are secured in a different way.  Similar to the views of both Dretske and Burge, having a Wrightean entitlement to accept a proposition does not require that one be able to think about what it is that gives one the entitlement (Wright 2007, Fn 6).  If Wright’s proposal is tenable, we find a way to circumvent the skeptical problem: we have unearned warrants (in the form of entitlements) to type-III propositions that are acquired independently of the I-II-III argument. Hence the skeptic has no grounds for accusing the anti-skeptic of viciously circular reasoning.

It is helpful to briefly compare and contrast Wrightean entitlement with the Burgean view discussed in the previous section.  One interesting similarity has to do with the connection between entitlement and justification as they relate to the structure of our warranted beliefs.  For both Burge and Wright, entitlements reside at the very foundation of the epistemic architecture of our beliefs.  All of our justified beliefs are ultimately based upon, or at least presuppose, entitlements.  For this reason, defenders of the entitlement-justification distinction are naturally affiliated with foundationalism, the view that there exist warranted beliefs which are not themselves warranted, or justified, by any further beliefs to which one could appeal.  In contrast, those who deny that such a distinction exists naturally steer toward coherentism or holism (see Sellars 1963, Davidson 1986, Cohen 2002).  However, Burge and Wright differ with respect to the propositions they claim reside at the foundation.  As we saw in the previous section, Burgean entitlements attach to beliefs concerning ordinary objects and properties in the world, which are non-inferentially sourced in perception, testimony, and memory.  The beliefs we rationally infer on the basis of them are justified.  In contrast, Wrightean entitlements attach to cornerstone propositions.  Although we do not typically infer further propositions on the basis of them, cornerstones provide the vital preconditions needed for our experiences or memory states to evidentially justify other (type-II) propositions.

Related to this last point, Burge can be seen as taking a liberal stance toward perceptual warrant, in that one’s experience alone provides one with immediate, non-inferential warrant for one’s perceptual beliefs.  In contrast, Wright adopts epistemic conservatism, according to which an experience provides warrant for a perceptual belief only on the condition that one has a prior warrant to accept the relevant type-III propositions (The terms ‘liberal’ and ‘conservative’ in epistemology are due to Pryor 2004.  See also Wright 2007).

One question that Wright raises is: What do our entitlements give us the right to do? Whereas for both Dretske and Burge our entitlements are rights to believe propositions, Wright has a different answer.  He suggests that part of what it is to hold a belief attitude toward a proposition is for that attitude to be controlled by reasoning and evidence.  Since entitlements are characteristically unaccompanied by evidence, he denies that they attach to belief.  Rather, where P is a proposition to which we have an entitlement, we are entitled to accept P.  Acceptance is a general kind of attitude of which belief is only one mode.  But, if belief is not the appropriate mode of acceptance for entitlement, what is it?  One suggestion Wright considers is ‘acting on the assumption that P’, but he immediately dismisses this because one can surely act on the assumption that a proposition is true while at the same time remaining agnostic or even skeptical of its truth.  Because entitlements provide essential preconditions for our having any warrant at all, whatever kind of attitude we have entitlements to must be something wherein one’s coming to doubt its truth would commit one to doubting the competence of the particular project in question.  Wright in the end settles on our having an entitlement to rationally trust P, where trust is a kind of acceptance weaker than belief (because it is not controlled by evidence), but stronger than acting on the assumption (because one is non-evidentially committed to the truth of P).

Wright’s position on what we have entitlements to raises a serious question regarding epistemic closure, according to which it is a necessary condition on being justified in believing P that one is also justified in believing those propositions one knows to be entailed by P.  Thus, given that my experience as of hands justifies me in believing HAND (the type-II proposition that I have hands), and I know that this entails ~BIV (the type-III proposition that I am not a handless brain in a vat) I must also be justified, according to closure, in believing ~BIV.  Yet, although Wright maintains that we have non-evidential entitlements to rationally trust type-III propositions, he denies that we are justified in believing them.  His proposal, therefore, appears to be at odds with closure.

In response to this alleged problem, Wright advises that we should qualify standard closure principles in such a way that we need not accept that evidentially justified belief is closed under known entailment.  Rather, if we let warrant range disjunctively over both entitlement and justification, we can allow that warranted acceptance (which ranges over belief; taking for granted; rational trust; acting on the assumption; and so forth) is so closed.  Thus, given that I am warranted in accepting HAND (in the form of a justified belief), and also that I know HAND entails ~BIV, I am warranted in accepting ~BIV (in the form of an entitled trust).  The upshot is that the warrant for a type-III proposition does not come by way inferring it from the related type-II proposition (for the type-II fails to transmit its warrant to the type-III), but this is nonetheless consistent with Wright’s qualified closure principle.

We will now consider two possible objections to Wright’s view.  As for the first objection, many will agree that:

(*) If it were antecedently reasonable to reject a type-III proposition, the warrant for the relevant type-II propositions would be removed.

The skeptic takes this thought one step further and concludes that:

(**) Type-II propositions can be warranted only if it is antecedently reasonable to accept type-III propositions.

Wright endorses (**), prompting him to characterize entitlements as positive warrants to trust.  However, Martin Davies (2004) has argued that by accepting (**), Wright concedes too much to the skeptic.  Instead, Davies claims that the inference from (*) to (**) is invalid: from the fact that my having reasonable doubt that ~BIV would defeat my warrant for believing HAND, it does not follow that I must have warrant for ~BIV in order to have warrant for HAND.  An alternative strategy would be to agree that doubt of ~BIV would defeat the warrant for HAND, while at the same time denying that one needs warranted trust in ~BIV in order for my experience as of hands to warrant HAND.  Davies thinks both of these claims can be met by attributing a different kind of entitlement to type-III propositions like ~BIV.  His suggestion is that we have entitlements not to doubt, not to call in question, or not to bother about, type-III propositions (2004, p. 226).  Thus, whereas a Wrightean entitlement is an entitlement to adopt a positive attitude of trust, Davies holds that it is an entitlement to adopt a negative attitude of not doubting; one would not need any positive warrant, earned or unearned, for type-III propositions to have warrant for type-II propositions.  One could take this approach one step even further and claim that type-II propositions do, contrary to what Wright says, transmit their warrants to type-III propositions.  In other words, the I-II-III argument is epistemically victorious: where I have no reason to doubt that I am a brain in a vat, my experience as of hands warrants me in believing HAND, which thereby warrants me in believing ~BIV when I draw the inference.  Whether or not this is a plausible anti-skeptical outcome is highly controversial (For a defense, see Pryor 2000 and 2004; for a rejection, see Cohen 2002).

A second objection to Wright’s view comes from Carrie Jenkins (2007), who has argued that even if we grant Wright that it is rational for us to accept, without evidence, cornerstone propositions, this cannot be an epistemic kind of rationality.  For any proposition P, one can be epistemically rational in accepting P only if one’s acceptance is brought about in a way that addresses the specific question of whether P is true.  Thus, in order for it to be epistemically rational of you to accept the proposition that China is the most populous country, your coming into this state of acceptance must be due, in part at least, to the fact that you take it to be true that China is the most populous country.  However, where P is a cornerstone proposition, like “My sensory apparatus is properly connected to the external world,” one’s acceptance of P is divorced from any considerations on the truth or falsity of P.  Instead, on the Wrightean view, accepting P is rational, roughly, because its acceptance is necessary in order to undertake the indispensible cognitive project of forming beliefs about the world based on perception.  This is a different kind of rationality, grounded not in terms of whether P is true, but in what fortunate consequences would result from one’s accepting P.  This is similar to the sense in which it would be rational (perhaps practically rational) for a runner in a race to believe she is not tired, since the act of forming this belief could actually prevent her from slowing down in the race.  It is doubtful that we could have epistemic entitlements to cornerstone propositions without it being epistemically rational to accept them.  This creates an obstacle for Wright given that his ultimate aim is to resolve the problem of skepticism in epistemology.

4. Peacocke on Entitlement

In his book, The Realm of Reason, Christopher Peacocke argues that we have entitlements to our perceptual beliefs, a priori beliefs, beliefs based on inductive inference, beliefs about our own actions, and moral beliefs.  Our entitlements to the latter four classes of belief are explained as extensions and consequences of the explanatory structure of our entitlement to perceptual beliefs.  Accordingly, this section will focus on Peacocke’s account of perceptual entitlement.

Peacocke does not distinguish entitlement from justification in the way that Dretske, Burge, and Wright do.  His notion of ‘entitlement’ is intended to range over both inferential and non-inferential transitions between mental states.  For Peacocke, entitlement plays a more central role in epistemology, for he claims that a judgment or belief is knowledge only if it is reached by a transition to which the subject is entitled.  Indeed, at times he seems to use the terms ‘entitlement’ and ‘justification’ interchangeably.  So, whereas for Dretske, Burge, and Wright, entitlements and justifications are distinct epistemic goods that make separable contributions to knowledge, Peacocke seems only to be operating with one epistemic concept, which he frequently refers to as entitlement.  As for another difference, we saw that entitlements for Burge and Dretske attach to beliefs, while Wrightean entitlements attach to attitudes of rational trust.  For Peacocke, we have entitlements not only to beliefs or judgments, but also to the transitions that link beliefs to antecedent mental states.  So, part of what it takes to have a perceptual entitlement to the belief, for example, that there is something round ahead, is that one is also entitled to the transition that brings one from having an experience of something round to the formation of that belief.  Nonetheless, a crucial element of Peacockean entitlement common to those of the other three authors discussed in this article is his position that “[a] thinker may be entitled to make a judgment without having the capacity to think about the states which entitle him to make the judgment” (2004, p. 7).

In order to understand Peacocke’s account of perceptual entitlement, it is important first to appreciate two conditions he thinks any transition must meet in order to award a subject an entitlement.  The first condition is conveyed in what he calls the Special Truth Conduciveness Thesis:

A fundamental and irreducible part of what makes a transition one to which one is entitled is that the transition tends to lead to true judgments…in a distinctive way characteristic of rational transitions (2004, p. 11).

Here we see that Peacocke agrees with Burge that entitlement (or for Burge, all forms of warrant) must be a good route to truth.  A necessary condition on entitlement for both Peacocke and Burge is that whichever state produces the entitled judgment or belief is a reliable indicator of the way things are in the world.  Note that this condition is not necessary for Dretskean entitlement, for it could be that a fully responsible agent cannot avoid believing there to be a bright screen ahead of her while her perceptual faculties are in fact highly unreliable (as would be the case were the agent a brain in a vat).  But the principle also implies that not just any transition leading to true judgments is sufficient for an entitlement.  In addition, the transition must be one that is characteristic of rational transitions.  Some processes encompass transitions between states which are highly reliable, yet these transitions are not what we would consider rational.  For example, suppose that due to some psychological defect, whenever I see a cardinal fly above me, this visual experience causes me to judge that the St. Louis Cardinals baseball team won today.  By sheer coincidence the only time that I see cardinals flying are on days when the Cardinals happen to win.  This transition between the state of seeing a cardinal and the state of judging that the Cardinals won tends to lead to true judgments, yet it is clear that it is quite irrational of me to form these judgments (for a similar sort of example, see Bonjour 1985).  What, then, is it that distinguishes specifically rational transitions?  The answer is given by what Peacocke calls the Rationalist Dependence Thesis, which is the second condition necessary for securing an entitlement:

The rational truth-conduciveness of any given transition to which a thinker is entitled is to be philosophically explained in terms of the nature of the intentional contents and states involved in the transition (2004, p. 52).

According to this second condition, whether or not a transition is rational depends on the specific explanation for why that transition is reliable.  The feature that is characteristic of rational transitions, according to Peacocke, is that they are reliable because of the very nature of the mental states involved, the contents that they have and how it is that those states are capable of representing the world in a certain way.  If the reliability of some transition is explained by something other than the very identity of the states involved in the transition and the individuation of their contents (such as if it were some mere accident that a type of experience reliably led to true judgments, as in the cardinal example above), then that transition, though reliable, would not be rational and would therefore fail to yield any entitlement.

With the two above theses introduced, we see that transitions between states yield entitlements only if they are conducive to truth, and furthermore their being reliable can be philosophically explained in terms of the states involved in the transition.  With regard to perceptual entitlement in particular, the kinds of experiences Peacocke thinks are relevant to meeting this criterion are those which have instance-individuated contents, such as the experience expressed by “That thing looks round.”  What makes this experience’s content instance-individuated is that when one’s perceptual faculties are properly functioning, and the environment is normal, one’s having this experience with this content is “caused by the holding of the condition which is in fact the correctness condition for that content” (2004, p. 67).  In simpler terms, the correct perceptual representation of an object as round does not causally depend on any other mental states or relations aside from the subject’s being properly connected to that round object in the world.  In contrast, an experience expressed by “There looks to be a soldier over there” does not have instance-individuated content because one’s correctly representing a soldier causally depends not only on there being a soldier where one represents it as being, but also on the background empirical knowledge one needs to have of what it is to be a soldier, how soldiers typically dress, and so on.

A Peacockean perceptual entitlement can thus be described as follows: “A subject enjoying an experience with a content which is instance-individuated is entitled to judge that content (that is, accept that experience at face value), in the absence of reasons for doubting that she is perceiving properly.”  Note that in the presence of reasons for doubt, one’s entitlement is removed.  Thus, Peacockean entitlement, like that of Dretske, Burge and Wright, has defeasibility conditions built into it.

The central task for Peacocke is to offer a philosophical explanation of the entitlement relation between experiences with instance-individuated contents and their corresponding perceptual judgments, which will consist of an a priori argument that demonstrates that the transitions between these states are conducive to truth.  His strategy is to argue that the existence of perceptual experiences with instance-individuated contents is best explained by the fact that those experiences are produced by a device that evolved by natural selection to represent the world to the subject, and that the perceptual experiences produced in the subject are predominantly correct.  Moreover, judgments based on these experiences are likely to be true.  To defend this claim, he relies on what he calls the Complexity Reduction Principle:

Other things equal, good explanations of complex phenomena explain the more complex in terms of the less complex; they reduce complexity (2004, p. 83).

This principle describes a key feature of what makes an explanation a good one.  When we are presented with some complex phenomenon, the explanation we should endorse, out of all the alternatives, is the one that explains the phenomenon in the least complex terms.  By accepting this principle, we are accepting that “it is…more rational to hold, other things equal, that [things] have come about in an easy, rather than in a highly improbable, way” (2004, p. 83).  Consider one of Peacocke’s own cases stemming from natural science.  Every snowflake contains six identical patterns separated by sixty-degree segments around its center.  This is an example of a complex phenomenon, one that immediately strikes us as highly improbable.  The best explanation for why snowflakes exhibit this pattern will inform us, by reducing complexity, that the alleged improbability is merely apparent: oxygen molecules in frozen water are roughly spherical and they are arranged on a plane.  The frozen crystals grow in a way that minimizes energy, and the most energy-efficient way of packing spheres on a plane results in a hexagonal arrangement (2004, p. 75-6).  One possible alternative explanation could be that snowflakes are built on skeletons that exhibit six-fold symmetry.  However, the latter explanation is less preferable to the former, because the latter is no less complex than the phenomenon itself: we would simply shift the question to why it is that the skeleton, rather than the snowflake, exhibits this pattern.

Like the example of snowflakes, our having experiences with instance-individuated contents is a highly complex phenomenon.  That the perceptual system produces states that are in large part correct, and was naturally selected to accurately represent the world to the subject, explains the phenomenon with the least amount of complexity.  A subject’s being in a state of perceptually representing an object o as having property F would not appear improbable if an Fo in the environment caused the state, and the subject had a properly functioning system that had adapted over the millennia, by way of interacting with objects like o’s and properties like F-ness, to accurately represent features in the environment.  It is a virtue of this explanation that it does not posit any further representational states that are equally as complex as the perceptual states under discussion and are, in turn, in need of explanation.

Peacocke argues further that the proposed explanation succeeds at reducing complexity better than alternative skeptical hypotheses.  There are two general types of such hypotheses he considers.  The first is one in which the subject’s illusory perceptual states are produced by some intentional agent, such as the Cartesian Demon.  In this scenario, it is typically postulated that the deceiver either has experiences herself, in which case our perceptual states get explained in terms of another’s perceptual states, or she lacks experiences but has other intentional states with comparable complexity.  Either way, the hypothesis purporting to explain the phenomenon under discussion would stand in need of further explanation.  In the second type of skeptical hypothesis, our illusory experiences are not intentionally produced, but are instead generated randomly or coincidentally, such as your being a member of a randomly generated universe containing nothing but a population of deluded brains in vats (see Putnam 2000).  However, this sort of hypothesis involves highly complex initial conditions, such as the original set up describing how the vats are capable of producing conscious, intentional states.  Thus, it fails to reduce the complexity of the phenomenon of our having perceptual states.

To summarize, Peacocke justifies the claim that we are entitled to form judgments about the world on the basis of our experiences with instance-individuated contents, on the grounds that our having these experiences with these contents is best explained by the evolution of the perceptual system and its selection for accurate representation of the environment.  We will consider a number of criticisms of Peacocke’s view.  First, in attempting to give a philosophical explanation of the truth-conduciveness of the transition between experience and judgment, we have seen that Peacocke invokes the theory of natural selection.  But because his aim is to prove that our experiences are by and large correct, his argument cannot depend on any empirically justified premises.  However, natural selection is an empirical scientific theory that is justified in part by our experiences, so we should not expect that it could be used to answer the skeptic.  Peacocke insists though that his argument “does not have the truth of the whole empirical biological theory of evolution by natural selection as one of its premises” (2004, p. 98).  But if Peacocke’s argument is sound, and he is right that each premise is justified a priori, the implication, as Ralph Wedgwood (2007) notes, is that no scientific investigation was required whatsoever for Darwin to justify the claim that he evolved through natural selection—all he needed to do to learn that the theory of evolution is true was to engage in philosophical contemplation and to reflect on his own experiences.  But the suggestion that a theory such as this one could be justified a priori seems highly implausible.

Another challenge to Peacocke’s project is to question whether the natural selection-based explanation reduces complexity any more than the alternative explanations.  The skeptic will argue that the existence of living creatures and the evolution of psychological systems within some of its members is itself a complex phenomenon standing in need of further explanation.  In addition, the skeptic could reject the Complexity Reduction Principle altogether: that an explanation is simpler, or succeeds at reducing complexity, does not speak to whether it is the one we ought to accept (see Lycan 1988; for Peacocke’s response see 2004, p. 94-7).

Finally, even if we grant that the Complexity Reduction Principle is true and that the natural selection-based explanation demonstrates that judgments sourced in perception tend toward truth, one might still question whether it adequately demonstrates how transitions between experience and judgment are characteristically rational (that is, whether it appropriately conforms to the Rationalist Dependence Thesis).  In order for us to rationally rely on our (reliably accurate) experiences, is it the case that we must also know, or justifiably believe, that the natural selection-based explanation most reduces complexity?  Peacocke thinks the answer must be negative; otherwise, anyone unaware of the Complexity Reduction Principle (which, presumably, is most people) would lack entitlements to their perceptual beliefs, and moreover would lack perceptual knowledge.  Instead, he holds that it is sufficient that the transition from experience to judgment be rational from the subject’s own point of view, that is, that the subject appreciates that her experiential grounds for the transition to the judgment that P suffice for the truth of P (2004, p. 176).  However, Miguel Fernández (2006) notes a problem with this move.  When one comes to “appreciate one’s grounds,” this involves, at least on a natural interpretation of appreciate, that one forms an additional judgment, specifically, a second-order judgment of the form:

SOJ: This experience representing P provides adequate grounds for the truth of P.

Of course, if one’s judgment that SOJ is partially underwriting one’s entitlement to judge that P, then it must be that the transition leading one to judge SOJ is also rational from the subject’s own point of view.  To meet this requirement, however, one would need to then hold a third-order judgment of the form:

TOJ: My grounds for judging SOJ are adequate for the truth of SOJ.

The problem is that because TOJ would also need to be rational from the subject’s own point of view, we are forced into an implausible infinite regress of increasingly higher-order judgments, each used to rationalize the transition attached to the lower-ordered judgment.  Demanding that one form all of these judgments would seem to hyper-intellectualize perceptual entitlement, and it would go against Peacocke’s position, mentioned at the beginning of the section, that a subject can be entitled to a judgment without having the capacity to think about the states that entitle that judgment.  In order to avoid this undesirable outcome, Peacocke could attempt to elucidate the notion of “appreciating one’s grounds” in a way that does not suggest forming a higher-order judgment.  Or, if that option is not feasible, he could, in following Dretske and Burge, relinquish the requirement altogether that a transition be rational from the subject’s own point of view.

5. Conclusion

This article has explored the views of epistemic entitlement as presented by four prominent philosophers: Dretske, Burge, Wright, and Peacocke.  As we have seen, there are important similarities and differences among these views.  Burge and Peacocke both hold that reliability is necessary for enjoying perceptual entitlements, but also that the reliability must be explained in terms of the nature and individuation of the perceptual states involved.  For both Wright and Peacocke, their accounts of entitlement purport to provide anti-skeptical outcomes about knowledge, while Dretskean and Burgean entitlement is explained independently of the skeptical problem.  According to Dretske and Burge we have entitlements to hold various non-inferential beliefs.  In contrast, Wright holds that what we are entitled to do is to rationally trust certain corner stone propositions, like that there is an external world and there is a past.  Peacocke differs from the other three authors in that he claims that all rational judgments, as well as the transitions leading to those judgments, are underwritten by entitlements.  Despite these differences, one element common to each of the views we have discussed is the idea that entitlements are defeasible epistemic rights that are not grounded in conceptually accessible reasons or evidence.  One can have an entitlement even if one is unable to think about the states that provide the entitlement.  In this regard, distinguishing entitlement from justification has the advantage of attributing a kind of positive epistemic status to individuals who lack the critical reasoning skills needed to justify their own beliefs.  The inclusion of the concept of entitlement therefore steers away from hyper-intellectualizing the warrant for our basic beliefs about the world.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston W. (1989). Epistemic Justification: Essays in the Theory of Knowledge. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
    • A collection of essays on justification and knowledge written by William Alston.
  • Alston, W. (1989a). “The Deontological Conception of Epistemic Justification.” in Alston (1989).
    • Provides a series of arguments against deontological views of justification which center around the concepts of duty, praiseworthy, requirement, blameless by relying heavily on the impossibility of our having control over our beliefs.
  • Alston, W. (1989b). “An Internalist Externalism.” in Alston (1989).
    • Attempts to reconcile the internalism/externalism debate in epistemology by advancing a view of justification that incorporates both internalist and externalist elements.
  • Bach, K. (1985). “A Rationale for Reliabilism.” The Monist, 68: 246-265.
    • Defends reliabilism against its more well-known objections by drawing a distinction between a justified belief and a subject’s being justified in holding a belief.
  • Bonjour, L. (1985). The Structure of Empirical Knowledge. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Develops an anti-foundationalist, coherentist theory of knowledge.
  • Burge, T. (1993). “Content Preservation.” The Philosophical Review, 102 (4): 457-488.
    • Argues that we have non-inferential entitlements to rely on the testimony of others.
  • Burge T. (1996). “Our Entitlement to Self-knowledge.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 96 (1): 91-116.
    • Argues that we have entitlements to beliefs about our own mental states.
  • Burge, T. (2003). “Perceptual Entitlement.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 67 (3): 503-548.
    • Provides a teleological account of perceptual entitlements as grounded in the anti-individualistic nature of perception.
  • Burge, T. (2005). “Disjunctivism and Perceptual Psychology.” Philosophical Topics, 33 (1): 1-78.
    • Argues against the view of perception called Disjunctivism on the grounds that it conflicts with established psychological theories of vision.
  • Burge T. (2007). Foundations of Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A collection of Burge’s papers in philosophy of mind on anti-individualism.
  • Burge, T. (2007a). “Cartesian Error and the Objectivity of Perception.” in Burge (2007).
    • Defends the claim that our perceptual states are anti-individualistically individuated and introduces his famous Crack-Shadow thought experiment.
  • Casullo, A. (2009). “What is Entitlement?” Acta Analytica, 22: 267-279.
    • Provides a detailed overview and critique of Burge’s proposed distinction between entitlement and justification.
  • Chisholm, R. (1977). Theory of Knowledge. (2nd edition) Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
    • Defends a deontological conception of knowledge and justification.
  • Cohen, S. (2002). “Basic Knowledge and the Problem of Easy Knowledge.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 65 (2): 309-329.
    • Denies the existence of basic knowledge (knowledge obtained from a source prior to one’s knowing that that source is reliable) through considerations involving closure and bootstrapping.
  • Comesaña, J. (2002). “The Diagonal and the Demon.” Philosophical Studies, 110: 249-266.
    • Advances a new version of reliabilism called Indexical Reliabilism, then argues it circumvents the New Evil Demon Problem.
  • Conee, E and Feldman, R. (1985). “Evidentialism.” Philosophical Studies, 48: 15-34.
    • Defends evidentialism in epistemology, the view that the justification of one’s belief is determined by the strength of one’s evidence for that belief.
  • Davidson, D. (1986). “A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge.” in E. Lepore (ed.) Truth and Interpretation: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson. Blackwell Publishing.
    • Argues for coherentism about truth and knowledge.
  • Davies, M. (2004). “Epistemic Entitlement, Warrant Transmission and Easy Knowledge.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Issue 78 (1): 213-245.
    • Critically discusses Crispin Wright’s views on entitlement, and advances the idea of a negative entitlement not to doubt cornerstone propositions.
  • Dretske, F. (2000). “Entitlement: Epistemic Rights without Epistemic Duties?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 60 (3): 591-606.
    • Argues for the existence of epistemic entitlements as grounded in the immediacy and irresistibility of various beliefs and motivated by the New Evil Demon Problem.
  • Dretske, F. (2005). “The Case Against Closure.” in M. Steup and E. Sosa (eds.) Contemporary Debates in Epistemology. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.
    • Rejects closure by first assuming skepticism is false, and secondly by arguing for the disjunction that either closure is false or skepticism is true.
  • Evans, G. (1982). The Varieties of Reference. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Proposes a theory of demonstrative thought in this seminal work, and introduces the notion of nonconceptual content.
  • Fernandez. M. (2006). “Troubles with Peacocke’s Rationalism.” Critica, 38 (112): 81-103.
    • Critically discusses Christopher Peacocke’s (2004) book, The Realm of Reason.
  • Ginet, C. (1975). Knowledge, Perception, and Memory. Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
    • Argues for a strong version of internalism, according to which all of the facts that make a subject’s beliefs justified are directly recognizable by the subject upon reflection.
  • Goldman, A. (1986). Epistemology and Cognition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Makes a case for epistemology to draw upon the findings in cognitive science.
  • Goldman. A. (1988). “Strong and Weak Justification.” Philosophical Perspectives, 2: 51-69.
    • Advances a modified version of reliabilism that places a distinction between the concepts of strong justification and weak justification.
  • Heck, R. (2007). "Are There Different Kinds of Content?" in B. McLaughlin and J. Cohen (eds.), Contemporary Debates in Philosophy of Mind. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.
    • Argues for the existence of nonconceptual content based on the implausibility of perceptual content, satisfying Gareth Evans’ generality constraint on thought.
  • Henderson, D. and Horgan, T. (2007). “Some Ins and Outs of Transglobal Reliabilism.” in S. Goldberg (ed.), Internalism and Externalism in Semantics and Epistemology. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Advances a new version of reliabilism called transglobal reliabilism, according to which the reliability of a belief process is evaluated relative to the set of experientially possible global environments.
  • Janvid, M. (2009). “The Value of Lesser Goods: The Epistemic Value of Entitlement.”  Acta Analytica, 24: 263-274.
    • Compares the epistemic value of entitlement with that of justification, and criticizes both Burgean and Dretskean entitlement.
  • Jenkins, C. (2007). “Entitlement and Rationality.” Synthese, 157: 25-45.
    • Challenges Crispin Wright’s entitlement of cognitive project, arguing that such entitlement to accept a proposition cannot be construed as epistemically rational.
  • Lehrer, K and Cohen, S. (1983). “Justification, Truth, and Coherence.” Synthese, 55: 191-207.
    • Challenges the time-honored connection between justification and truth by introducing what is nowadays commonly referred to as the New Evil Demon Problem.
  • Lycan, W. (1988). Judgement and Justification. Cambridge, MA: Cambridge University Press.
    • Defends a version of epistemological explanationism as a theory of justification.
  • Majors, B. (2005). “The New Rationalism.” Philosophical Papers, 34 (2): 289-305.
    • A critical discussion of Christopher Peacocke’s (2004) book, The Realm of Reason.
  • Majors, B and Sawyer, S. (2005). “The Epistemological Argument for Content Externalism.” Philosophical Perspectives, 19: 257-280.
    • Argues that that the only epistemological view that can adequately account for the constitutive relation between justification and truth is one that involves a commitment to content externalism.
  • Millikan, R. (1984). Language, Thought and Other Biological Categories. Cambridge, MA: MIT press.
    • Develops a naturalistic account of language and thought, wherein the meaning associated with sentences and the intentionality associated with thoughts are to be explicated in terms of how sentences and thoughts properly function.
  • Peacocke, C. (1992). A Study of Concepts. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Proposes a theory of concepts in which concepts are individuated by their possession conditions, and also introduces the notions of ‘scenario content’ and ‘protoproposition’ as they apply to perceptual content.
  • Peacocke, C. (2001). "Does Perception have a Nonconceptual Content?" Journal of Philosophy, 98: 609-615.
    • Defends the claim that perception has nonconceptual content, and wards off criticisms from John McDowell and Bill Brewer.
  • Peacocke, C. (2004). The Realm of Reason. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Develops a rationalist picture of epistemic entitlement according to which we have entitlements to our perceptual beliefs, a priori beliefs, beliefs based on inductive inference, beliefs about our own actions, and moral beliefs.
  • Pryor, J. (2000). "The Skeptic and the Dogmatist." Nous, 34: 517-49.
    • Defends dogmatism, a modest foundationalist view according to which an experience as of p’s being the case provides one with a prima facie justification to believe that p, without requiring that one have independent reason to believe one is not in a skeptical scenario.
  • Pryor, J. (2001). “Recent Highlights of Epistemology.” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 52: 95-124.
    • Canvases a host of popular topics in contemporary epistemology, including contextualism, modest foundationalism, the internalism/externalism debate, and the ethics of belief.
  • Pryor, J. (2004). “What’s wrong with Moore’s Argument?” Philosophical Issues, 14: 349-378.
    • Defends the Moorean response to skepticism.
  • Putnam, H. (2000). “Brains in a Vat.” in S. Bernecker and F. Dretske (eds.), Knowledge: Readings in Contemporary Epistemology. Oxford University Press.
    • Appeals to externalist accounts of meaning to argue that the statement, “I am a brain in a vat,” is self-defeating, and so cannot be true.
  • Sellars, W. (1963). Science, Perception and Reality. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Famously argues against the “Myth of the Given” and develops a broadly coherentist epistemology.
  • Stroud, B. (1977). Hume. New York: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Offers a detailed overview of Hume’s philosophy, including the Problem of Induction.
  • Wedgwood, R. (2007). “Christopher Peacocke’s The Realm of Reason.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 74 (3): 776-791.
    • Critically discusses Christopher Peacocke’s book, The Realm of Reason.
  • Williams, M. (2000). “Dretske on Epistemic Entitlement.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 60 (3): 607-612.
    • Critically discusses Fred Dretske’s (2000) paper, “Entitlement: Epistemic Rights without Epistemic Duties?”
  • Wright, C. (2003). “Some Reflections on the Acquisition of Warrant by Inference” in S. Nuccetelli (ed.), New Essays on Semantic Externalism, Skepticism and Self-Knowledge. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Explains the difference between a cogent argument and an argument in which the premises fails to transmit their warrants to the conclusion.
  • Wright, C. (2004). “Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free)?” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 78 (1):167–212.
    • Develops the notion of unearned entitlements for cornerstone propositions, and explores the prospects and limitations on strategic entitlement, entitlement of cognitive project, entitlement of rational deliberation, and entitlement of substance.
  • Wright, C. (2007). “The Perils of Dogmatism.” in S. Nuccetelli and G. Seay (eds.), Themes from G. E. Moore: New Essays in Epistemology and Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Presents a series of problems for dogmatist accounts of justification.


Author Information

Jon Altschul
Loyola University-New Orleans
U. S. A.