Aristotle: Logic

Aristotelian logic, after a great and early triumph, consolidated its position of influence to rule over the philosophical world throughout the Middle Ages up until the 19th Century.  All that changed in a hurry when modern logicians embraced a new kind of mathematical logic and pushed out what they regarded as the antiquated and clunky method of syllogisms.  Although Aristotle’s very rich and expansive account of logic differs in key ways from modern approaches, it is more than a historical curiosity.  It provides an alternative way of approaching logic and continues to provide critical insights into contemporary issues and concerns.  The main thrust of this article is to explain Aristotle’s logical system as a whole while correcting some prominent misconceptions that persist in the popular understanding and even in some of the specialized literature.  Before getting down to business, it is important to point out that Aristotle is a synoptic thinker with an over-arching theory that ties together all aspects and fields of philosophy.  He does not view logic as a separate, self-sufficient subject-matter, to be considered in isolation from other aspects of disciplined inquiry.  Although we cannot consider all the details of his encyclopedic approach, we can sketch out the larger picture in a way that illuminates the general thrust of his system.  For the purposes of this entry, let us define logic as that field of inquiry which investigates how we reason correctly (and, by extension, how we reason incorrectly).  Aristotle does not believe that the purpose of logic is to prove that human beings can have knowledge.  (He dismisses excessive scepticism.)  The aim of logic is the elaboration of a coherent system that allows us to investigate, classify, and evaluate good and bad forms of reasoning.

Table of Contents

  1. The Organon
  2. Categories
  3. From Words into Propositions
  4. Kinds of Propositions
  5. Square of Opposition
  6. Laws of Thought
  7. Existential Assumptions
  8. Form versus Content
  9. The Syllogism
  10. Inductive Syllogism
  11. Deduction versus Induction
  12. Science
  13. Non-Discursive Reasoning
  14. Rhetoric
  15. Fallacies
  16. Moral Reasoning
  17. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. The Organon

To those used to the silver tones of an accomplished writer like Plato, Aristotle’s prose will seem, at first glance, a difficult read.  What we have are largely notes, written at various points in his career, for different purposes, edited and cobbled together by later followers.  The style of the resulting collection is often rambling, repetitious, obscure, and disjointed.  There are many arcane, puzzling, and perhaps contradictory passages.  This problem is compounded by the abstract, technical vocabulary logic sometimes requires and by the wide-ranging scope and the scattered nature of Aristotle’s observations.  Some familiarity with Greek terminology is required if one hopes to capture the nuances in his thought.  Classicists and scholars do argue, of course, about the precise Greek meaning of key words or phrases but many of these debates involve minor points of interpretation that cannot concern us here.  Aristotle’s logical vocabulary needs to be understood within the larger context of his system as a whole.  Many good translations of Aristotle are available.  (Parenthetical citations below include the approximate Bekker number (the scholarly notation for referring to Aristotelian passages according to page, column, and line number of a standard edition), the English title of the work, and the name of the translator.)

Ancient commentators regarded logic as a widely-applicable instrument or method for careful thinking.  They grouped Aristotle’s six logical treatises into a sort of manual they called the Organon (Greek for “tool”).  The Organon included the Categories, On Interpretation, the Prior Analytics, the Posterior Analytics, the Topics, and On Sophistical Refutations.  These books touch on many issues: the logical structure of propositions, the proper structure of arguments (syllogisms), the difference between induction and deduction, the nature of scientific knowledge, basic fallacies (forms of specious reasoning), debating techniques, and so on.  But we cannot confine our present investigations to the Organon.  Aristotle comments on the principle of non-contradiction in the Metaphysics, on less rigorous forms of argument in the Rhetoric, on the intellectual virtues in the Nicomachean Ethics, on the difference between truth and falsity in On the Soul, and so on.  We cannot overlook such important passages if we wish to gain an adequate understanding of Aristotelian logic.

2. Categories

The world, as Aristotle describes it in his Categories, is composed of substances—separate, individual things—to which various characterizations or properties can be ascribed.  Each substance is a unified whole composed of interlocking parts.  There are two kinds of substances.  A primary substance is (in the simplest instance) an independent (or detachable) object, composed of matter, characterized by form.  Individual living organisms—a man, a rainbow trout, an oak tree—provide the most unambiguous examples of primary substances.  Secondary substances are the larger groups, the species or genera, to which these individual organisms belong.  So man, horse, mammals, animals (and so on) would be examples of secondary substances.  As we shall see, Aristotle’s logic is about correctly attributing specific properties to secondary substances (and therefore, indirectly, about attributing these properties to primary substances or individual things).

Aristotle elaborates a logic that is designed to describe what exists in the world.  We may well wonder then, how many different ways can we describe something?  In his Categories (4.1b25-2a4), Aristotle enumerates ten different ways of describing something.  These categories (Greek=kategoria, deriving from the verb to indicate, signify) include (1) substance, (2) quantity, (3) quality, (4) relation, (5) where, (6) when, (7) being-in-a-position, (8) possessing, (9) doing or (10) undergoing something or being affected by something.  In the Topics (I.9, 103b20-25), he includes the same list, replacing “substance” (ousia) with “essence” (ti esti).  We can, along with Aristotle, give an example of each kind of description: (1) to designate something as a “horse” or a “man” is to identify it as a substance or to attribute an essence to it; (2) to say that the wall is four feet long is to describe it in terms of quantity; (3) to say that the roof  is “white” is to ascribe a quality to it; (4) to say that your weight is “double” mine is to describe a relation between the two; (5) to say something happened in the market-place is to explain where; (6) to say it happened last year is to explain when; (7) to say an old man is sitting is to describe his position; (8) to say the girl has shoes on is to describe what she possesses; (9) to say the head chef is cutting a carrot with a knife is to describe what he is doing; and finally, (10) to say wood is being burned in the fireplace is to describe what it means for the wood to undergo burning or to be affected by fire.  Commentators claim that these ten categories represent either different descriptions of being or different kinds of being.  (To be a substance is to be in a certain way; to possess quantity is to be in a certain way; to possess a quality is to be in a certain way, and so on.)  There is nothing magical about the number ten.  Aristotle gives shorter lists elsewhere. (Compare Posterior Analytics, I.22.83a22-24, where he lists seven predications, for example).  Whether Aristotle intends the longer lists as a complete enumeration of all conceivable types of descriptions is an open question.  Scholars have noticed that the first category, substance or essence, seems to be fundamentally different than the others; it is what something is in the most complete and perfect way.

3. From Words into Propositions

Aristotle does not believe that all reasoning deals with words.  (Moral decision-making is, for Aristotle, a form of reasoning that can occur without words.)  Still, words are a good place to begin our study of his logic.  Logic, as we now understand it, chiefly has to do with how we evaluate arguments.  But arguments are made of statements, which are, in turn, made of words.  In Aristotelian logic, the most basic statement is a proposition, a complete sentence that asserts something.  (There are other kinds of sentences—prayers, questions, commands—that do not assert anything true or false about the world and which, therefore, exist outside the purview of logic.)  A proposition is ideally composed of at least three words: a subject (a word naming a substance), a predicate (a word naming a property), and a connecting verb, what logicians call a copula (Latin, for “bond” or “connection”).  Consider the simple statement: “Socrates is wise.”  Socrates is the subject; the property of being wise is the predicate, and the verb “is” (the copula) links Socrates and wisdom together in a single affirmation.  We can express all this symbolically as “S is P” where “S” stands for the subject “Socrates” and “P” stands for the predicate “being wise.”  The sentence “Socrates is wise” (or symbolically, “S is P”) qualifies as a proposition; it is a statement that claims that something is true about the world.  Paradigmatically, the subject would be a (secondary) substance (a natural division of primary substances) and the predicate would be a necessary or essential property as in:  “birds are feathered,” or “triangles have interior angles equal to two right angles,” or “fire is upward-moving.”  But any overly restrictive metaphysical idea about what terms in a proposition mean seems to unnecessarily restrict intelligent discourse.  Suppose someone were to claim that “anger is unethical.”  But anger is not a substance; it is a property of a substance (an organism).  Still, it makes perfect sense to predicate properties of anger.  We can say that anger is unethical, hard to control, an excess of passion, familiar enough, and so on.  Aristotle himself exhibits some flexibility here.  Still, there is something to Aristotle’s view that the closer a proposition is to the metaphysical structure of the world, the more it counts as knowledge.  Aristotle has an all-embracing view of logic and yet believes that, what we could call “metaphysical correctness” produces a more rigorous, scientific form of logical expression.

Of course, it is not enough to produce propositions; what we are after is true propositions.  Aristotle believes that only propositions are true or false.  Truth or falsity (at least with respect to linguistic expression) is a matter of combining words into complete propositions that purport to assert something about the world.  Individual words or incomplete phrases, considered by themselves, are neither true or false.  To say, “Socrates,” or “jumping up and down,” or “brilliant red” is not to assert anything true or false about the world.  It is to repeat words without making any claim about the way things are.  In the Metaphysics, Aristotle provides his own definition of true and false: “to say of what is that it is, and of what is not that it is not, is true”; and “to say of what is that it is not, or of what is not that it is, is false.” (IV.7.1011b25, Ross.)  In other words, a true proposition corresponds to way things are.  But Aristotle is not proposing a correspondence theory of truth as an expert would understand it.  He is operating at a more basic level.  Consider the statement: “Spiders have eight legs.”  (Symbolically, “All S is P,” where S, the subject, is “spiders”; P, the predicate, is “the state of being eight-legged,” and the verb “is” functions as the copula.)  What does it mean to say that this claim is true?  If we observe spiders to discover how many legs they have, we will find that (except in a few odd cases) spiders do have eight legs, so the proposition will be true because what it says matches reality.  As we shall see, Aristotle’s logic is designed to produce just this kind of general statement.

4. Kinds of Propositions

Aristotle suggests that all propositions must either affirm or deny something.  Every proposition must be either an affirmation or a negation; it cannot be both.  He also points out that propositions can make claims about what necessarily is the case, about what possibly is the case, or even about what is impossible.  His modal logic, which deals with these further qualifications about possibility or necessity, presents difficulties of interpretation.  We will focus on his assertoric (or non-modal) logic here.  Still, many of Aristotle’s points about necessity and possibility seem highly intuitive.  In one famous example about a hypothetical sea battle, he observes that the necessary truth of a mere proposition does not trump the uncertainty of future events.  Because it is necessarily true that there will be or will not be a sea battle tomorrow, we cannot conclude that either alternative is necessarily true.  (De Interpretatione, 9.19a30ff.)  So the necessity that attaches to the proposition “there will or will not be a sea battle tomorrow” does not transfer over to the claim ‘that there will be a sea battle tomorrow” or to the claim “there will not be a sea battle tomorrow.”  Aristotle goes out of his way to emphasize the point that our personal beliefs about what will happen in the future do not determine whether the individual propositions are true.  (Note that we must not confuse the necessary truth of a proposition with the necessity that precipitates the conclusion of a deductively-valid argument. The former is sometimes called “material,” “non-logical,” or “metaphysical” necessity; the later, “formal,” “deductive,” or “logical” necessity.”  We discuss these issues further below.)

Aristotle claims that all propositions can be expressed using the “Subject copula Predicate” formula and that complex propositions are, on closer inspection, collections of simpler claims that display, in turn, this fundamental structure.  Having fixed the proper logical form of a proposition, he goes on to classify different kinds of propositions.  He begins by distinguishing between particular terms and universal terms.  (The term he uses for “universal” is the Greek “katholou.”)  Particular terms refer to individual things; universal terms refer to groups of things.  The name “Socrates” is a particular term because it refers to a single human being; the word “spiders” is a universal term for it universally applies to all members of the group “spiders.”  Aristotle realizes, of course, that universal terms may be used to refer to parts of a group as well as to entire groups.  We may claim that all spiders have eight legs or that only some spiders have book-lungs.  In the first case, a property, eight-leggedness, is predicated of the entire group referred to by the universal term; in the second case, the property of having book-lungs is predicated of only part of the group.  So, to use Aristotelian language, one may predicate a property universally or not universally of the group referred to by a universal term.

This brings us to Aristotle’s classification of the four different kinds of categorical propositions (called “categorical propositions” because they assert a relationship between two categories or kinds).  Each different categorical proposition possesses quantity insomuch as it represents a universal or a particular predication (referring to all or only some members of the subject class).  It also possesses a definite quality (positive or negative) insomuch as it affirms or denies the specified predication.  The adjectives “all,” “no,” and “some” (which is understood as meaning “at least one”) determine the quantity of the proposition; the quality is determined by whether the verb is in the affirmative or the negative.  Rather than going into the details of Aristotle’s original texts, suffice it to say that contemporary logicians generally distinguish between four logical possibilities:

1.  Universal Affirmation: All S are P (called A statements from the Latin, “AFFIRMO”: I affirm).

2.  Universal Negation: No S are P (called E statements from “NEGO”: I deny).

3.  Particular Affirmation: Some S are P (called I statements from AFFIRMO).

4.  Particular Negation: Some S are not P (called O statements from NEGO).

Note that these four possibilities are not, in every instance, mutually exclusive.  As mentioned above, particular statements using the modifier “some” refer to at least one member of a group.  To say that “some S are P” is to say that “at least one S is P”; to say that “some S are not P” is to say that “at least one S is not P.”  It must follow then (at least on Aristotle’s system) that universal statements require the corresponding particular statement.  If “All S are P,” at least one S must be P; that is, the particular statement “Some S are P” must be true.  Again, if “No S are P,” at least one S must not be P; that is, the particular statement “Some S are not P” must be true.  (More on this, with qualifications, below.)  Note also that Aristotle treats propositions with an individual subject such as “Socrates is wise” as universal propositions (as if the proposition was saying something like “all instances of Socrates” are wise.)  One caveat:  Although we cannot linger on further complications here, keep in mind that this is not the only way to divide up logical possibility.

5. Square of Opposition

Aristotle examines the way in which these four different categorical propositions are related to one another.  His views have come down to us as “the square of opposition,” a mnemonic diagram that captures, systematizes, and slightly extends what Aristotle says in De Interpretatione. (Cf. 6.17a25ff.)

Figure 1

The Traditional Square of Opposition


As it turns out, we can use a square with crossed interior diagonals (Fig. 1 above) to identify four kinds of relationships that hold between different pairs of categorical propositions.  Consider each relationship in turn.

1)  Contradictory propositions possess opposite truth-values.  In the diagram, they are linked by a diagonal line.  If one of two contradictories is true, the other must be false, and vice versa.  So the A proposition (All S are P) and the O proposition (Some S are not P) are contradictories.  Clearly, if it is true that “all S are P,” then the O statement that “some S are not P” must be false.  And if it is true that “some S are not P,” then the A statement that “all S are P” must be false.  The same relationship holds between E (No S are P) and I (Some S are P) propositions.  To use a simple example: If it is true that “all birds lay eggs,” then it must be false that “some birds do not lay eggs.”  And if it is true that “some birds do not fly,” then it must be false that “all birds fly.”

2)  Contrary propositions cannot both be true.  The top horizontal line in the square joining the A proposition (All S are P) to the E proposition (No S are P) represents this logical relationship.  Clearly, it cannot be true that “all S are P” and that “no S are P.”  The truth of one of these contrary propositions excludes the truth of the other.  It is possible, however, that both statements are false as in the case where some S are P and some (other) S are not P.  So, for example, the statements “all politicians tell lies” and “no politicians tell lies” cannot both be true.  They will, however, both be false if it is indeed the case that some politicians tell lies whereas some do not.

3)  The relationship of subalternation results when the truth of a universal proposition, “the superaltern,” requires the truth of a second particular proposition, “the subaltern.”  The vertical lines moving downward from the top to the bottom of the square in the diagram represent this condition.  Clearly, if all members of an existent group possess (or do not possess) a specific characteristic, it must follow that any smaller subset of that group must possess (or not possess) that specific characteristic.  If the A proposition (All S are P) is true, it must follow that the I proposition (“Some S are P”) must be true.  Again, if the E proposition (No S are P) is true, it must follow that the O proposition (Some S are not P) must be true.  Consider, for example, the statement, “all cheetahs are fast.”  If every member of the whole group of cheetahs is fast, then it must be the case that at least one member of the group of cheetahs is fast; that is, the statement “some cheetahs are fast” must be true.  And, to reformulate the same example as a negation, if it is true that “no cheetahs are slow,” then it must be the case that at least one member of the group of cheetahs is not slow; that is, the statement “some cheetahs are not slow” must be true.

Note that subalternation does not work in the opposite direction.  If “Some S are P,” it need not follow that “All S are P.”  And if “Some S are not P,” it need not follow that “No S are P.”  We should also point out that if the subaltern is false, it must follow that the superaltern is false.  If it is false to say that “Some S are P,” it must be false to say that “All S are P.”  And if it is false to say that “Some S are not P,” it must be false to say that “No S are P.”

4)  Subcontrary propositions cannot both be false.  The bottom horizontal line in the square joining the I proposition (Some S are P) to the O proposition (Some S are not P) represents this kind of subcontrary relationship.  Keeping to the assumptions implicit in Aristotle’s system, there are only three possibilities: (1) All S have property P; in which case, it must also be true (by subalternation) that “some S are P.”  (2) No S have property P; in which case it must also be true (by subalternation) that “some S are not P.”  (3)  Some S have and some S do not have property P; in which case it will be true that “some S are P” and that “some S are not P.”  It follows that at least one of a pair of subcontrary propositions must be true and that both will be true in cases where P is partially predicated of S.  So, for example, both members of the subcontrary pair “some men have beards” and “some men do not have beards” are true.  They are both true because having a beard is a contingent or variable male attribute.  In contrast, only one member of the subcontrary pair “some snakes are legless” and “some snakes are not legless” is true.  As all snakes are legless, the proposition “some snakes are not legless” must be false.

Traditional logicians, inspired by Aristotle’s wide-ranging comments, identified a series of “immediate inferences” as a way of deriving new propositions through a routine rearrangement of terms.  Subalternation is an obvious example of immediate inference.  From “All S are P” we can immediately infer—that is, without argument—that “some S are P.”  They also recognized conversion, obversion, and contraposition as immediate inferences.

In conversion, one interchanges the S and P terms.  If, for example, we know that “No S is P,” we can immediately infer that “No P is S.”  (Once we know that “no circles are triangles,” we know right away that “no triangles are circles.”)

In obversion, one negates the predicate term while replacing it with the predicate term of opposite quality.  If, for example, we know that “Some S are P,” we can immediately infer the obverse, “Some S are not non-P.”  (Once we know that “some students are happy,” we know right away that “some students are not unhappy.”)

Finally, in contraposition, one negates both terms and reverses their order.  If, for example, we know that “All S are P,” we can infer the contrapositive “All non-P are non-S.”  (Once we know that “all voters are adults,” we know right away that “all children are unable to vote.”)  More specific rules, restrictions, and details are readily available elsewhere.

6. Laws of Thought

During the 18th, 19th, and early 20th Century, scholars who saw themselves as carrying on the Aristotelian and Medieval tradition in logic, often pointed to the “laws of thought” as the basis of all logic.  One still encounters this approach in textbook accounts of informal logic.  The usual list of logical laws (or logical first principles) includes three axioms: the law of identity, the law of non-contradiction, and the law of excluded middle.  (Some authors include a law of sufficient reason, that every event or claim must have a sufficient reason or explanation, and so forth.)  It would be a gross simplification to argue that these ideas derive exclusively from Aristotle or to suggest (as some authors seem to imply) that he self-consciously presented a theory uniquely derived from these three laws.  The idea is rather that Aristotle’s theory presupposes these principles and/or that he discusses or alludes to them somewhere in his work.  Traditional logicians did not regard them as abstruse or esoteric doctrines but as manifestly obvious principles that require assent for logical discourse to be possible.

The law of identity could be summarized as the patently unremarkable but seemingly inescapable notion that things must be, of course, identical with themselves.  Expressed symbolically: “A is A,” where A is an individual, a species, or a genus.  Although Aristotle never explicitly enunciates this law, he does observe, in the Metaphysics, that “the fact that a thing is itself is [the only] answer to all such questions as why the man is man, or the musician musical.” (VII.17.1041a16-18, Ross.)  This suggests that he does accept, unsurprisingly, the perfectly obvious idea that things are themselves.  If, however, identical things must possess identical attributes, this opens the door to various logical maneuvers.  One can, for example, substitute equivalent terms for one another and, even more portentously, one can arrive at some conception of analogy and induction.  Aristotle writes, “all water is said to be . . .  the same as all water  . . .  because of a certain likeness.” (Topics, I.7.103a19-20, Pickard-Cambridge.)  If water is water, then by the law of identity, anything we discover to be water must possess the same water-properties.

Aristotle provides several formulations of the law of non-contradiction, the idea that logically correct propositions cannot affirm and deny the same thing:

“It is impossible for anyone to believe the same thing to be and not be.” (Metaphysics, IV.3.1005b23-24, Ross.)

“The same attribute cannot at the same time belong and not belong to the same subject in the same respect.” (Ibid., IV.3.1005b19-20.)

“The most indisputable of all beliefs is that contradictory statements are not at the same time true.” (Ibid., IV.6.1011b13-14.)

Symbolically, the law of non-contradiction is sometimes represented as “not (A and not A).”

The law of excluded middle can be summarized as the idea that every proposition must be either true or false, not both and not neither.  In Aristotle’s words, “It is necessary for the affirmation or the negation to be true or false.”  (De Interpretatione, 9.18a28-29, Ackrill.)  Symbolically, we can represent the law of excluded middle as an exclusive disjunction: “A is true or A is false,” where only one alternative holds.  Because every proposition must be true or false, it does not follow, of course, that we can know if a particular proposition is true or false.

Despite perennial challenges to these so-called laws (by intuitionists, dialetheists, and others), Aristotelians inevitably claim that such counterarguments hinge on some unresolved ambiguity (equivocation), on a conflation of what we know with what is actually the case, on a false or static account of identity, or on some other failure to fully grasp the implications of what one is saying.

7. Existential Assumptions

Before we move on to consider Aristotle’s account of the syllogism, we need to clear up some widespread misconceptions and explain a few things about Aristotle’s project as a whole.  Criticisms of Aristotle’s logic often assume that what Aristotle was trying to do coincides with the basic project of modern logic.  Begin with the usual criticism brought against the traditional square of opposition.  For reasons we will not explore, modern logicians assume that universal claims about non-existent objects (or empty sets) are true but that particular claims about them are false.  On this reading, the claim that “all fairy-god mothers are beautiful” is true, whereas the claim that “some fairy-god mothers are beautiful” is false.  Clearly, this clashes with the traditional square of opposition.  By simple subalternation, the truth of the proposition “all fairy-god mothers are beautiful” requires the truth of the proposition “some fairy-god mothers are beautiful.”  If the first claim is true, the second claim must also be true.  For this and similar reasons, some modern logicians dismiss the traditional square as inadequate, claiming that Aristotle made a mistake or overlooked relevant issues.  Aristotle, however, is involved in a specialized project.  He elaborates an alternative logic, specifically adapted to the problems he is trying to solve.

Aristotle devises a companion-logic for science.  He relegates fictions like fairy godmothers and mermaids and unicorns to the realms of poetry and literature.  In his mind, they exist outside the ambit of science.  This is why he leaves no room for such non-existent entities in his logic.  This is a thoughtful choice, not an inadvertent omission.  Technically, Aristotelian science is a search for definitions, where a definition is “a phrase signifying a thing’s essence.” (Topics, I.5.102a37, Pickard-Cambridge.)  To possess an essence—is literally to possess a “what-it-is-to-be” something (to ti ēn einai).  Because non-existent entities cannot be anything, they do not, in Aristotle’s mind, possess an essence.  They cannot be defined.  Aristotle makes this point explicitly in the Posterior Analytics.  He points out that a definition of a goat-stag, a cross between a goat and a deer (the ancient equivalent of a unicorn), is impossible.  He writes, “no one knows the nature of what does not exist—[we] can know the meaning of the phrase or name ‘goat-stag’ but not what the essential nature of a goat-stag is.” (II.7.92b6-8, Mure.)  Because we cannot know what the essential nature of a goat-stag is—indeed, it has no essential nature—we cannot provide a proper definition of a goat-stag.  So the study of goat-stags (or unicorns) is not open to scientific investigation.  Aristotle sets about designing a logic that is intended to display relations between scientific propositions, where science is understood as a search for essential definitions.  This is why he leaves no place for fictional entities like goat-stags (or unicorns).  Hence, the assumed validity of a logical maneuver like subalternation.

8. Form versus Content

However, this is not the only way Aristotle’s approach parts ways with more modern assumptions.  Some modern logicians might define logic as that philosophical inquiry which considers the form not the content of propositions.  Aristotle’s logic is unapologetically metaphysical.  We cannot properly understand what Aristotle is about by separating form from content.  Suppose, for example, I was to claim that (1) all birds have feathers and (2) that everyone in the Tremblay family wears a red hat.  These two claims possess the same very same propositional form, A.  We can represent the first claim as: “All S are P,” where S=birds, and P=being feathered.  And we can also represent the second claim as “All S are P,” where S=members of the Tremblay family, and P=wearing a red hat.  Considered from an Aristotelian point of view, however, these two “All S are P” propositions possess a very different logical status.  Aristotle would view the relationship between birds and feathers expressed in the first proposition as a necessary link, for it is of the essence of birds to be feathered.  Something cannot be a bird and lack feathers.  The link between membership in the Tremblay family and the practice of wearing a red hat described in the second proposition is, in sharp contrast, a contingent fact about the world.  A member of the Tremblay family who wore a green hat would still be a member of the Tremblay family.  The fact that the Tremblays only wear red hats (because it is presently the fashion in Quebec) is an accidental (or surface) feature of what a Tremblay is.  So this second relationship holds in a much weaker sense.  In Aristotle’s mind, this has important consequences not just for metaphysics, but for logic.

It is hard to capture in modern English the underlying metaphysical force in Aristotle’s categorical statements.  In the Prior Analytics Aristotle renders the phrase “S is P” as “P belongs to S.”  The sense of belonging here is crucial.  Aristotle wants a logic that tells us what belongs to what.  But there are different levels of belonging.  My billfold belongs to me but this is a very tenuous sort of belonging.  The way my billfold belongs to me pales in significance to, say, the way a bill belongs to a duck-billed platypus.  It is not simply that the bill is physically attached to the platypus.  Even if you were to cut off the bill of a platypus, this would just create a deformed platypus; it would not change the sense of necessary belonging that connects platypuses and bills.  The deep nature of a platypus requires—it necessitates—a bill.  In so much as logic is about discovering necessary relationships, it is not the mere arrangement of terms and symbols but their substantive meaning that is at issue.

As only one consequence of this “metaphysical attitude,” consider Aristotle’s attitude towards inductive generalizations. Aristotle would have no patience for the modern penchant for purely statistical interpretations of inductive generalizations.  It is not the number of times something happens that matters.  It is the deep nature of the thing that counts.  If the wicked boy (or girl) next door pulls three legs off a spider, this is just happenstance.  This five-legged spider does not (for Aristotle) present a serious counterexample to the claim that “all spiders are eight-legged.”  The fact that someone can pull legs off a spider does not change the fact that there is a necessary connection between spiders and having eight legs.  Aristotle is too keen a biologist not to recognize that there are accidents and monstrosities in the world, but the existence of these individual imperfections does not change the deep nature of things.  Aristotle recognizes then that some types of belonging are more substantial—that is, more real—than others.  But this has repercussions for the ways in which we evaluate arguments.  In Aristotle’s mind, the strength of the logical connection that ties a conclusion to the premises in an argument depends, decisively, on the metaphysical status of the claims we are making.  Another example may help.  Suppose I were to argue, first:  “Ostriches are birds; all birds have feathers, therefore, ostriches have feathers.”  Then, second, “Hélène is the youngest daughter of the Tremblay family; all members of the Tremblay family wear red hats; therefore, Hélène wears a red hat.”  These arguments possess the same form.  (We will worry about formal details later.)  But, to Aristotle’s way of thinking, the first argument is, logically, more rigorous than the second.  Its conclusion follows from the essential and therefore necessary features of birds.  In the second argument, the conclusion only follows from the contingent state of fashion in Quebec.  In Aristotelian logic, the strength of an argument depends, in some important way, on metaphysical issues.  We can’t simply say “All S are P; and so forth” and be done with it.  We have to know what “S” and “P” stand for.  This is very different than modern symbolic logic.  Although Aristotle does use letters to take the place of variable terms in a logical relation, we should not be misled into thinking that the substantive content of what is being discussed does not matter.

9. The Syllogism

We are now in a position to consider Aristotle’s theory of the syllogism.  Although one senses that Aristotle took great pride in these accomplishments, we could complain that the persistent focus on the mechanics of the valid syllogism has obscured his larger project.  We will only cover the most basic points here, largely ignoring hypothetical syllogisms, modal syllogisms, extended syllogisms (sorites), inter alia.  The syllogistic now taught in undergraduate philosophy departments represents a later development of Aristotle’s ideas, after they were reworked at the hands of Medieval and modern logicians.  We will begin with a brief account of the way syllogisms are presented in modern logic and then move on to discussion of Aristotle’s somewhat different account.

We can define a syllogism, in relation to its logical form, as an argument made up of three categorical propositions, two premises (which set out the evidence), and a conclusion (that follows logically from the premises).  In the standard account, the propositions are composed of three terms, a subject term, a predicate term, and a middle term: the subject term is the (grammatical) subject of the conclusion; the predicate term modifies the subject in the conclusion, and the middle term links the subject and predicate terms in the premises.  The subject and predicate terms appear in different premises; the middle term appears once in each premise.  The premise with the predicate term and the middle term is called the major premise; the premise with the subject term and the middle term is called the minor premise.  Because syllogisms depend on the precise arrangement of terms, syllogistic logic is sometimes referred to as term logic.  Most readers of this piece are already familiar with some version of a proverbial (non-Aristotelian) example: “All men are mortal; (all) Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle are men; therefore, Socrates, Plato and Aristotle are mortal.”  If we symbolize the three terms in this syllogism such that Middle Term, M=man; Subject Term, S=Socrates, Plato, Aristotle; Predicate Term, P=mortal; we can represent the argument as: Major Premise:  All M is P;  Minor Premise:  All S is M;  Conclusion:  So, All S is P.  In the Middle Ages, scholars came up with Latin names for valid syllogisms, using vowels to represent the position of each categorical proposition.  (Their list is readily available elsewhere.)  The precise arrangement of propositions in this syllogism goes by the Latin moniker “Barbara” because the syllogism is composed of three A propositions: hence, BArbArA: AAA.  A syllogism in Barbara is clearly valid where validity can be understood (in modern terms) as the requirement that if the premises of the argument are true, then the conclusion must be true.  Modern textbook authors generally prove the validity of syllogisms in two ways.  First, they use a number of different rules.  For example: “when major and minor terms are universal in the conclusion they must be universal in the premises”; “if one premise is negative, the conclusion must be negative”; “the middle term in the premises must be distributed (include every member of a class) at least once,” and so on.  Second, they use Venn diagrams, intersecting circles marked to indicate the extension (or range) of different terms, to determine if the information contained in the conclusion is also included in the premises.

Modern logicians, who still hold to traditional conventions, classify syllogisms according to figure and mood.  The four figure classification derives from Aristotle; the mood classification, from Medieval logicians.  One determines the figure of a syllogism by recording the positions the middle term takes in the two premises.  So, for Barbara above, the figure is MP-SM, generally referred to as Figure 1.  One determines the mood of a syllogism by recording the precise arrangement of categorical propositions.  So, for Barbara, the mood is AAA.  By tabulating figures and moods, we can make an inventory of valid syllogisms.  (Medieval philosophers devised a mnemonic poem for such purposes that begins with the line “Barbara, Celarent, Darii, Ferioque priorisis.”  Details can be found in many textbooks.)  Although traditional classroom treatments prefer to stick to this time-honoured approach, Fred Sommers and George Englebretsen have devised a more up-to-date term logic that uses equations with “+” and “−” operators and is more attuned to natural language reasoning than the usual predicate logic.  Turn then to a brief discussion of Aristotle’s own account of the syllogism.

As already mentioned, we need to distinguish between two kinds of necessity.  Aristotle believes in metaphysical or natural necessity.  Birds must have feathers because that is their nature.  So the proposition “All birds have feathers” is necessarily true.”  But Aristotle identifies the syllogistic form with the logical necessity that obtains when two separate propositions necessitate a third.  He defines a sullogismos as “a discourse [logos] in which, certain things being stated, something other than what is stated follows of necessity from them.” (Prior Analytics, I.1.24b18-20, Jenkinson.)  The emphasis here is on the sense of inevitable consequence that precipitates a conclusion when certain forms of propositions are added together.  Indeed, the original Greek term for syllogism is more rigorously translated as “deduction.”  In the Prior Analytics, Aristotle’s method is exploratory.  He searches for pairs of propositions that combine to produce a necessary conclusion.  He begins by accepting that a few syllogisms are self-evidently (or transparently) true.  Barbara, AAA-Fig.1, discussed above, is the best example of this kind of “perfect syllogism.”  Another example of a perfect syllogism is Celarent: EAE-Fig.1.  On seeing the arrangement of terms in such cases, one immediately understands that the conclusion follows necessarily from the premises.  In the case of imperfect syllogisms Aristotle relies on a method of proof that translates them, step-by-step, into perfect syllogisms through a careful rearrangement of terms.  He does this directly, through conversion, or indirectly, through the relationships of contradiction and contrariety outlined in the square of opposition.  To cite only one very simple example, consider a brief passage in the Prior Analytics (I.5.27a5ff) where Aristotle demonstrates that the propositions “No P are M,” and “All S are M” can be combined to produce a syllogism with the conclusion, “No S are P.”  If “No P are M,” it must follow that “No M are P” (conversion); but “No M are P” combined with the second premise, “All S are M” proves that “No S are P.”  (This is to reduce the imperfect syllogism Cesare to the perfect syllogism Celarent.)  This conversion of an imperfect syllogism into a perfect syllogism demonstrates that the original arrangement of terms is a genuine deduction.  In other cases, Aristotle proves that particular arrangements of terms cannot yield proper syllogisms by showing that, in these instances, true premises lead to obviously false or contradictory conclusions.  Alongside these proofs of logical necessity, Aristotle derives general rules for syllogisms, classifies them according to figure, and so on.

It is important to reiterate that Aristotelian syllogisms are not (primarily) about hypothetical sets, imaginary classes, or purely abstract mathematical entities.  Aristotle believes there are natural groups in the world—species and genera—made up of individual members that share a similar nature, and hence similar properties.   It is this sharing of individual things in a similar nature that makes universal statements possible.  Once we have universal terms, we can make over-arching statements that, when combined, lead inescapably to specific results.  In the most rigorous syllogistic, metaphysical necessity is added to logical necessity to produce an unassailable inference.  Seen in this Aristotelian light, syllogisms can be construed as a vehicle for identifying the deep, immutable natures that make things what they are.

Medieval logicians summarized their understanding of the rationale underlying the syllogism in the so-called dictum de omni et nullo (the maxim of all and none), the principle that whatever is affirmed or denied of a whole must be affirmed or denied of a part (which they alleged derived from a reading of Prior Analytics I.1.24b27-30).  Some contemporary authors have claimed that Aristotelian syllogistic is at least compatible with a deflationary theory of truth, the modern idea that truth-claims about propositions amount to little more than an assertion of the statement itself.  (To say that “S is P” is true, is just to assert “S is P.”)  Perhaps it would be better to say that one can trace the modern preoccupation with validity in formal logic to the distinction between issues of logical necessity and propositional truth implicit in Aristotle.  In Aristotle’s logic, arguments do not take the form: “this state of affairs is true/false,” “this state of affairs is true/false,” therefore this state of affairs is true/false.”  We do not argue “All S is M is true” but merely, “All S is M.”  When it comes to determining validity—that is, when it comes to determining whether we have discovered a true syllogism—the question of the truth or falsity of propositions is pushed aside and attention is focused on an evaluation of the logical connection between premises and conclusion.  Obviously, Aristotle recognizes that ascertaining the material truth of premises is an important part of argument evaluation, but he does not present a “truth-functional” logic.  The concept of a “truth value” does not play any explicit role in his formal analysis the way it does, for example, with modern truth tables.  Mostly, Aristotle wants to know what we can confidently conclude from two presumably true premises; that is, what kind of knowledge can be produced or demonstrated if two given premises are true.

10. Inductive Syllogism

Understanding what Aristotle means by inductive syllogism is a matter of serious scholarly dispute.  Although there is only abbreviated textual evidence to go by, his  account of inductive argument can be supplemented by his ampler account of its rhetorical analogues, argument from analogy and argument from example.  What is clear is that Aristotle thinks of induction (epagoge) as a form of reasoning that begins in the sense perception of particulars and ends in a understanding that can be expressed in a universal proposition (or even a concept).  We pick up mental momentum through a familiarity with particular cases that allows us to arrive at a general understanding of an entire species or genus.  As we discuss below, there are indications that Aristotle views induction, in the first instance, as a manifestation of immediate understanding and not as an argument form.  Nonetheless, in the Prior Analytics II.23 (and 24), he casts inductive reasoning in syllogistic form, illustrating the “syllogism that springs out of induction” (ho ex epagoges sullogismos) by an argument about the longevity of bileless animals.

Relying on old biological ideas, Aristotle argues that we can move from observations about the longevity of individual species of bileless animals (that is, animals with clean-blood) to the universal conclusion that bilelessness is a cause of longevity.  His argument can be paraphrased in modern English: All men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived; all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals; therefore, all bileless animals are long-lived.  Although this argument seems, by modern standards, invalid, Aristotle apparently claims that it is a valid deduction.  (Remember that the word “syllogism” means “deduction,” so an “inductive syllogism” is, literally, an “inductive deduction.”)  He uses a technical notion of “convertibility” to formally secure the validity of the argument.  According to this logical rule, terms that cover the same range of cases (because they refer to the same nature) are interchangeable (antistrepho).  They can be substituted for one another.  Aristotle believes that because the logical terms “men, horses, mules, etc” and “bileless animals” refer to the same genus, they are convertible.  If, however, we invert the terms in the proposition “all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals” to “all bileless animals are men, horses, mules, and so forth,” we can then rephrase the original argument: All men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived; all bileless animals are men, horses, mules, and so forth; therefore, all bileless animals are long-lived.  This revised induction possesses an obviously valid form (Barbara, discussed above).  Note that Aristotle does not view this inversion of terms as a formal gimmick or trick; he believes that it reflects something metaphysically true about shared natures in the world.  (One could argue that inductive syllogism operates by means of the quantification of the predicate term as well as the subject term of a categorical proposition, but we will not investigate that issue here.)

These passages pose multiple problems of interpretation.  We can only advance a general overview of the most important disagreements here.  We might identify four different interpretations of Aristotle’s account of the inductive syllogism.  (1)  The fact that Aristotle seems to view this as a valid syllogism has led many commentators (such as Ross, McKirahan, Peters) to assume that he is referring to what is known as “perfect induction,” a generalization that is built up from a complete enumeration of particular cases.  The main problem here is that it seems to involve a physical impossibility.  No one could empirically inspect every bileless animal (and/or species) to ascertain that the connection between bilelessness and longevity obtains in every case.  (2) Some commentators combine this first explanation with the further suggestion that the bileless example is a rare case and that Aristotle believes, in line with modern accounts, that most inductions only produce probable belief.  (Cf. Govier’s claim that there is a “tradition going back to Aristotle, which maintains that there are  . . .  only two broad types of argument: deductive arguments which are conclusive, and inductive arguments, which are not.”  (Problems in Argument Analysis, 52.))  One problem with such claims is that they overlook the clear distinction that Aristotle makes between rigorous inductions and rhetorical inductions (which we discuss below).  (3)  Some commentators claim that Aristotle (and the ancients generally) overlooked the inherent tenuousness of the inductive reasoning.  On this account, Empiricists such as Locke and Hume discovered something seriously wrong about induction that escaped the notice of an ancient author like Aristotle.  Philosophers in the modern Anglo-American tradition largely favor this interpretation.  (Cf. Garrett’s and Barbanell’s insistence that “Hume was the first to raise skeptical doubts about inductive reasoning, leaving a puzzle as to why the concerns he highlighted had earlier been so completely overlooked.”  (“Induction,” 172.)  Such allegations do not depend, however, on any close reading of a wealth of relevant passages in the Aristotelian corpus and in ancient philosophy generally.  (4) Finally, a minority contemporary view, growing in prominence, has argued that Aristotle did not conceive of induction as an enumerative process but as a matter of intelligent insight into natures.  (Cf. McCaskey, Biondi, Rijk , Groarke.)  On this account, Aristotle does not mean to suggest that inductive syllogism depends on an empirical inspection of every member of a group but on a universal act of understanding that operates through sense perception.  Aristotelian induction can best be compared to modern notions of abduction or inference to the best explanation.  This non-mathematical account has historical precedents in neo-Platonism, Thomism, Idealism, and in the textbook literature of traditionalist modern logicians that opposed the new formal logic.  This view has been criticized, however, as a form of mere intuitionism dependent on an antiquated metaphysics.

The basic idea that induction is valid will raise eyebrows, no doubt.  It is important to stave off some inevitable criticism before continuing.  Modern accounts of induction, deriving, in large part, from Hume and Locke, display a mania for prediction.  (Hence Hume’s question: how can we know that the future bread we eat will nourish us based on past experience of eating bread?)  But this is not primarily how Aristotle views the problem.  For Aristotle, induction is about understanding natural kinds.  Once we comprehend the nature of something, we will, of course, be able to make predictions about its future properties, but understanding its nature is the key.  In Aristotle’s mind, rigorous induction is valid because it picks out those necessary and essential traits that make something what it is.  To use a very simple example, understanding that all spiders have eight legs—that is, that all undamaged spiders have eight legs—is a matter of knowing something deep about the biological nature that constitutes a spider.  Something that does not have eight legs is not a spider.  (Fruitful analogies might be drawn here to the notion of “a posteriori necessity” countenanced by contemporary logicians such as Hilary Putnam and Saul Kripke or to the “revised” concept of a “natural kind” advanced by authors such as Hilary Kornblith or Brian Ellis.)

It is commonly said that Aristotle sees syllogisms as a device for explaining relationships between groups.  This is, in the main, true.  Still, there has to be some room for a consideration of individuals in logic if we hope to include induction as an essential aspect of reasoning.  As Aristotle explains, induction begins in sense perception and sense perception only has individuals as its object.  Some commentators would limit inductive syllogism to a movement from smaller groups (what Aristotle calls “primitive universals”) to larger groups, but one can only induce a generalization about a smaller group on the basis of a prior observation of individuals that compose that group.  A close reading reveals that Aristotle himself mentions syllogisms dealing with individuals (about the moon, Topics, 78b4ff; about the wall, 78b13ff; about the eclipse, Posterior Analytics, 93a29ff, and so on.)  If we treat individuals as universal terms or as representative of universal classes, this poses no problem for formal analysis.  Collecting observations about one individual or about individuals who belong to a larger group can lead to an accurate generalization.

11. Deduction versus Induction

We cannot fully understand the nature or role of inductive syllogism in Aristotle without situating it with respect to ordinary, “deductive” syllogism.  Aristotle’s distinction between deductive and inductive argument is not precisely equivalent to the modern distinction.  Contemporary authors differentiate between deduction and induction in terms of validity.  (A small group of informal logicians called “Deductivists” dispute this account.)  According a well-worn formula, deductive arguments are valid; inductive arguments are invalid.  The premises in a deductive argument guarantee the truth of the conclusion: if the premises are true, the conclusion must be true.  The premises in an inductive argument provide some degree of support for the conclusion, but it is possible to have true premises and a false conclusion.  Although some commentators attribute such views to Aristotle, this distinction between strict logical necessity and merely probable or plausible reasoning more easily maps onto the distinction Aristotle makes between scientific and rhetorical reasoning (both of which we discuss below).  Aristotle views inductive syllogism as scientific (as opposed to rhetorical) induction and therefore as a more rigorous form of inductive argument.

We can best understand what this amounts to by a careful comparison of a deductive and an inductive syllogism on the same topic.  If we reconstruct, along Aristotelian lines, a deduction on the longevity of bileless animals, the argument would presumably run: All bileless animals are long-lived; all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals; therefore, all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived.  Defining the terms in this syllogism as: Subject Term, S=men, horses, mules, and so forth; Predicate Term, P=long-lived animals; Middle Term, M=bileless animals, we can represent this metaphysically correct inference as:  Major Premise: All M are P.  Minor Premise: All S are M.  Conclusion: Therefore all S are P.  (Barbara.)  As we already have seen, the corresponding induction runs: All men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived; all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals; therefore, all bileless animals are long-lived.  Using the same definition of terms, we are left with:  Major Premise: All S are P.  Minor Premise: All S are M (convertible to All M are S).  Conclusion: Therefore, all M are P.  (Converted to Barbara.)  The difference between these two inferences is the difference between deductive and inductive argument in Aristotle.

Clearly, Aristotelian and modern treatments of these issues diverge.  As we have already indicated, in the modern formalism, one automatically defines subject, predicate, and middle terms of a syllogism according to their placement in the argument.  For Aristotle, the terms in a rigorous syllogism have a metaphysical significance as well.  In our correctly formulated deductive-inductive pair, S represents individual species and/or the individuals that make up those species (men, horses, mules, and so forth); M represents the deep nature of these things (bilelessness), and P represents the property that necessarily attaches to that nature (longevity).  Here then is the fundamental difference between Aristotelian deduction and induction in a nutshell.  In deduction, we prove that a property (P) belongs to individual species (S) because it possesses a certain nature (M); in induction, we prove that a property (P) belongs to a nature (M) because it belongs to individual species (S).  Expressed formally, deduction proves that the subject term (S) is associated with a predicate term (P) by means of the middle term (M); induction proves that the middle term (M) is associated with the predicate term (P) by means of the subject term (S).  (Cf. Prior Analytics, II.23.68b31-35.)  Aristotle does not claim that inductive syllogism is invalid but that the terms in an induction have been rearranged.  In deduction, the middle term joins the two extremes (the subject and predicate terms); in induction, one extreme, the subject term, acts as the middle term, joining the true middle term with the other extreme.  This is what Aristotle means when he maintains that in induction one uses a subject term to argue to a middle term.  Formally, with respect to the arrangement of terms, the subject term becomes the “middle term” in the argument.

Aristotle distinguishes then between induction and deduction in three different ways.  First, induction moves from particulars to a universal, whereas deduction moves from a universal to particulars.  The bileless induction moves from particular species to a universal nature; the bileless deduction moves from a universal nature to particular species.  Second, induction moves from observation to language (that is, from sense perception to propositions), whereas deduction moves from language to language (from propositions to a new proposition).  The bileless induction is really a way of demonstrating how observations of bileless animals lead to (propositional) knowledge about longevity; the bileless deduction demonstrates how (propositional) knowledge of a universal nature leads (propositional) knowledge about particular species. Third, induction identifies or explains a nature, whereas deduction applies or demonstrates a nature.  The bileless induction provides an explanation of the nature of particular species: it is of the nature of bileless organisms to possess a long life.  The bileless deduction applies that finding to particular species; once we know that it is of the nature of bileless organisms to possess a long life, we can demonstrate or put on display the property of longevity as it pertains to particular species.

One final point needs clarification.  The logical form of the inductive syllogism, after the convertibility maneuver, is the same as the deductive syllogism.  In this sense, induction and deduction possess the same (final) logical form.  But, of course, in order to successfully perform an induction, one has to know that convertibility is possible, and this requires an act of intelligence which is able to discern the metaphysical realities between things out in the world.  We discuss this issue under non-discursive reasoning below.

12. Science

Aristotle wants to construct a logic that provides a working language for rigorous science as he understands it.  Whereas we have been talking of syllogisms as arguments, Aristotelian science is about explanation.  Admittedly, informal logicians generally distinguish between explanation and argument.  An argument is intended to persuade about a debatable point; an explanation is not intended to persuade so much as to promote understanding.  Aristotle views science as involving logical inferences that move beyond what is disputable to a consideration of what is the case.  Still, the “explanatory” syllogisms used in science possess precisely the same formal structures as “argumentative” syllogisms.  So we might consider them arguments in a wider sense.  For his part, Aristotle relegates eristic reason to the broad field of rhetoric.  He views science, perhaps naively, as a domain of established fact.  The syllogisms used in science are about establishing an explanation from specific cases (induction) and then applying or illustrating this explanation to specific cases (deduction).

The ancient Greek term for science, “episteme,” is not precisely equivalent to its modern counterpart.  In Aristotle’s worldview, science, as the most rigorous sort of discursive knowledge, is opposed to mere opinion (doxa); it is about what is universal and necessary as opposed to what is particular and contingent, and it is theoretical as opposed to practical.  Aristotle believes that knowledge, understood as justified true belief, is most perfectly expressed in a scientific demonstration (apodeixis), also known as an apodeitic or scientific syllogism.  He posits a number of specific requirements for this most rigorous of all deductions.  In order to qualify as a scientific demonstration, a syllogism must possess premises that are “true, primary, immediate, better known than, prior to, and causative of the conclusion.” (Posterior Analytics, I.2.71b20ff, Tredennick.)  It must yield information about a natural kind or a group of individual things.  And it must produce universal knowledge (episteme).  Specialists have disputed the meaning of these individual requirements, but the main message is clear.  Aristotle accepts, as a general rule, that a conclusion in an argument cannot be more authoritative than the premises that led to that conclusion.  We cannot derive better (or more reliable) knowledge from worse (or less reliable) knowledge.  Given that a scientific demonstration is the most rigorous form of knowledge possible, we must start with premises that are utterly basic and as certain as possible, which are “immediately” induced from observation, and which confirm to the necessary structure of the world in a way that is authoritative and absolutely incontrovertible.  This requires a reliance on first principles which we discuss below.

In the best case scenario, Aristotelian science is about finding definitions of species that, according to a somewhat bald formula, identify the genus (the larger natural group) and the differentia (that unique feature that sets the species apart from the larger group).  As Aristotle’s focus on definitions is a bit cramped and less than consistent (he himself spends a great deal of time talking about necessary rather than essential properties), let us broaden his approach to science to focus on ostensible definitions, where an ostensible definition is either a rigorous definition or, more broadly, any properly-formulated phrase that identifies the unique properties of something.  On this looser approach, which is more consistent with Aristotle’s actual practice, to define an entity is to identify the nature, the essential and necessary properties, that make it uniquely what it is.  Suffice it to say that Aristotle’s idealized account of what science entails needs to be expanded to cover a wide range of activities and that fall under what is now known as scientific practice.  What follows is a general sketch of his overall orientation.  (We should point out that Aristotle himself resorts to whatever informal methods seem appropriate when reporting on his own biological investigations without too much concern for any fixed ideal of formal correctness.  He makes no attempt to cast his own scientific conclusions in metaphysically-correct syllogisms.  One could perhaps insist that he uses enthymemes (syllogisms with unstated premises), but mostly, he just seems to record what seems appropriate without any deliberate attempt at correct formalization.  Note that most of Aristotle’s scientific work is “historia,” an earlier stage of observing, fact-collecting, and opinion-reporting that proceeds the principled theorizing of advanced science.)

For Aristotle, even theology is a science insomuch as it deals with universal and necessary principles.  Still, in line with modern attitudes (and in opposition to Plato), Aristotle views sense-perception as the proper route to scientific knowledge.  Our empirical experience of the world yields knowledge through induction.  Aristotle elaborates then an inductive-deductive model of science.  Through careful observation of  particular species, the scientist induces an ostensible definition to explain a nature and then demonstrates the consequences of that nature for particular species.  Consider a specific case.  In the Posterior Analytics (II.16-17.98b32ff, 99a24ff), Aristotle mentions an explanation about why deciduous plants lose their leaves in the winter.  The ancients apparently believed this happens because sap coagulates at the base of the leaf (which is not entirely off the mark).  We can use this ancient example of a botanical explanation to illustrate how the business of Aristotelian science is supposed to operate.  Suppose we are a group of ancient botanists who discover, through empirical inspection, why deciduous plants such as vines and figs lose their leaves.  Following Aristotle's lead, we can cast our discovery in the form of the following inductive syllogism:  “Vine, fig, and so forth, are deciduous.  Vine, fig, and so forth, coagulate sap.  Therefore, all sap-coagulators are deciduous.”  This induction produces the definition of “deciduous.”  (“Deciduous” is the definiendum; sap-coagulation, the definiens; the point being that everything that is a sap-coagulator is deciduous, which might not be the case if we turned it around and said “All deciduous plants are sap-coagulators.”)  But once we have a definition of “deciduous,” we can use it as the first premise in a deduction to demonstrate something about say, the genus “broad-leaved trees.”  We can apply, in other words, what we have learned about deciduous plants in general to the more specific genus of broad-leaved trees.  Our deduction will read:  “All sap-coagulators are deciduous.  All broad-leaved trees are sap-coagulators.  Therefore, all broad-leaved trees are deciduous.”  We can express all this symbolically.  For the induction, where S=vine, fig, and so forth, P=deciduous, M= being a sap-coagulator, the argument is: “All S is P; all S is M (convertible to all M is S); therefore, all M are P (converted to Barbara).  For the deduction, where S=broad-leafed trees, M=being a sap-coagulator, P=deciduous, the argument can be represented: “All M are P; all S is M; therefore, all S is P” (Barbara).  This is then the basic logic of Aristotelian science.

A simple diagram of how science operates follows (Figure 2).

Figure 2

The Inductive-Deductive Method of Aristotelian Science

Aristotle views science as a search for causes (aitia).  In a well-known example about planets not twinkling because they are close to the earth (Posterior Analytics, I.13), he makes an important distinction between knowledge of the fact and knowledge of the reasoned fact. The rigorous scientist aims at knowledge of the reasoned fact which explains why something is the way it is.  In our example, sap-coagulation is the cause of deciduous; deciduous is not the cause of sap-coagulation.  That is why “sap-coagulation” is featured here as the middle term, because it is the cause of the phenomenon being investigated.  The deduction “All sap-coagulators are deciduous; all broad-leaved trees are sap-coagulators; therefore, all broad-leaved trees are deciduous” counts as knowledge of the reasoned fact because it reveals the cause of broad-leafed deciduousness.

Aristotle makes a further distinction between what is more knowable relative to us and what is more knowable by nature (or in itself).  He remarks in the Physics, “The natural way of [inquiry] is to start from the things which are more knowable and obvious to us and proceed towards those which are clearer and more knowable by nature; for the same things are not ‘knowable relatively to us’ and ‘knowable’ without qualification.”  (I.184a15, Hardie, Gaye.)  In science we generally move from the effect to the cause, from what we see and observe around us to the hidden origins of things.  The outward manifestation of the phenomenon of “deciduousness” is more accessible to us because we can see the trees shedding their leaves, but sap-coagulation as an explanatory principle is more knowable in itself because it embodies the cause.  To know about sap-coagulation counts as an advance in knowledge; someone who knows this knows more than someone who only knows that trees shed their leaves in the fall.  Aristotle believes that the job of science is to put on display what best counts as knowledge, even if the resulting theory strays from our immediate perceptions and first concerns.

Jan Lukasiewicz, a modern-day pioneer in term logic, comments that “some queer philosophical prejudices which cannot be explained rationally” made early commentators claim that the major premise in a syllogism (the one with the middle and predicate terms) must be first.  (Aristotle’s Syllogistic, 32.)  But once we view the syllogism within the larger context of Aristotelian logic, it becomes perfectly obvious why these early commentators put the major premise first: because it constitutes the (ostensible) definition; because it contains an explanation of the nature of the thing upon which everything else depends.  The major premise in a scientific deduction is the most important part of the syllogism; it is scientifically prior in that it reveals the cause that motivates the phenomenon.  So it makes sense to place it first.  This was not an irrational prejudice.

13. Non-Discursive Reasoning

The distinction Aristotle draws between discursive knowledge (that is, knowledge through argument) and non-discursive knowledge (that is, knowledge through nous) is akin to the medieval distinction between ratio (argument) and intellectus (direct intellection).  In Aristotelian logic, non-discursive knowledge comes first and provides the starting points upon which discursive or argumentative knowledge depends.  It is hard to know what to call the mental power that gives rise to this type of knowledge in English.  The traditional term “intuition” invites misunderstanding.  When Aristotle claims that there is an immediate sort of knowledge that comes directly from the mind (nous) without discursive argument, he is not suggesting that knowledge can be accessed through vague feelings or hunches.  He is referring to a capacity for intelligent appraisal that might be better described as discernment, comprehension, or insight.  Like his later medieval followers, he views “intuition” as a species of reason; it is not prior to reason or outside of reason, it is—in the highest degree—the activity of reason itself.  (Cf. Posterior Analytics, II. 19; Nicomachean Ethics, IV.6.)

For Aristotle, science is only one manifestation of human intelligence.  He includes, for example, intuition, craft, philosophical wisdom, and moral decision-making along with science in his account of the five intellectual virtues.  (Nicomachean Ethics, VI.3-8.)  When it comes to knowledge-acquisition, however, intuition is primary.  It includes the most basic operations of intelligence, providing the ultimate ground of understanding and inference upon which everything else depends.  Aristotle is a firm empiricist.  He believes that knowledge begins in perception, but he also believes that we need intuition to make sense of perception.  In the Posterior Analytics (II.19.100a3-10), Aristotle posits a sequence of steps in mental development: sense perception produces memory which (in combination with intuition) produces human experience (empeiria), which produces art and science.  Through a widening movement of understanding (really, a non-discursive form of induction), intuition transforms observation and memory so as to produce knowledge (without argument).  This intuitive knowledge is even more reliable than science.  As Aristotle writes in key passages at the end of the Posterior Analytics, “no other kind of thought except intuition is more accurate than scientific knowledge,” and “nothing except intuition can be truer than scientific knowledge.” (100b8ff, Mure, slightly emended.)

Aristotelian intuition supplies the first principles (archai) of human knowledge: concepts, universal propositions, definitions, the laws of logic, the primary principles of the specialized science, and even moral concepts such as the various virtues.  This is why, according to Aristotle, intuition must be viewed as infallible.  We cannot claim that the first principles of human intelligence are dubious and then turn around and use those principles to make authoritative claims about the possibility (or impossibility) of knowledge.  If we begin to doubt intuition, that is, human intelligence at its most fundamental level of operation, we will have to doubt everything else that is built upon this universal foundation: science, philosophy, knowledge, logic, inference, and so forth.  Aristotle never tries to prove first principles.  He acknowledges that when it comes to the origins of human thought, there is a point when one must simply stop asking questions.  As he points out, any attempt at absolute proof would lead to an infinite regress.  In his own words: “It is impossible that there should be demonstration of absolutely everything; there would be an infinite regress, so that there would still be no demonstration.” (Metaphysics, 1006a6ff, Ross.)  Aristotle does make arguments, for example, that meaningful speech presupposes a logical axiom like the principle of non-contradiction, but that is not, strictly speaking, a proof of the principle.

Needless to say, Aristotle’s reliance on intuition has provoked a good deal of scholarly disagreement.  Contemporary commentators such as Joseph Owens, G. L. Owen, and Terrence Irwin have argued that Aristotelian first principles begin in dialectic.  On their influential account, we arrive at first principles through a weaker form of argument that revolves around a consideration of “endoxa,” the proverbial opinions of the many and/or the wise.  Robin Smith (and others) severely criticize their account.  The idea that mere opinion could somehow give rise to rigorous scientific knowledge conflicts with Aristotle’s settled view that less reliable knowledge cannot provide sufficient logical support for the more reliable knowledge.  As we discuss below, endoxa do provide a starting point for dialectical (and ethical) arguments in Aristotle’s system.  They are, in his mind, a potent intellectual resource, a library of stored wisdom and right opinion.  They may include potent expressions of first principles already discovered by other thinkers and previous generations.  But as Aristotle makes clear at the end of the Posterior Analytics and elsewhere, the recognition that something is a first principle depends directly on intuition.  As he reaffirms in the Nicomachean Ethics, “it is intuitive reason that grasps the first principles.”  (VI.6.1141a7, Ross.)

If Irwin and his colleagues seek to limit the role of intuition in Aristotle, authors such as Lambertus Marie de Rijk and D. W. Hamlyn go to an opposite extreme, denying the importance of the inductive syllogism and identifying induction (epagoge) exclusively with intuition.  De Rijk claims that Aristotelian induction is “a pre-argumentation procedure consisting in . . . [a] disclosure [that] does not take place by a formal, discursive inference, but is, as it were, jumped upon by an intuitive act of knowledge.” (Semantics and Ontology, I.2.53, 141-2.) Although this position seems extreme, it seems indisputable that inductive syllogism depends on intuition, for without intuition (understood as intelligent discernment), one could not recognize the convertibility of subject and middle terms (discussed above).  Aristotle also points out that one needs intuition to recognize the (ostensible) definitions so crucial to the practice of Aristotelian science.  We must be able to discern the difference between accidental and necessary or essential properties before coming up with a definition.  This can only come about through some kind of direct (non-discursive) discernment.  Aristotle proposes a method for discovering definitions called division—we are to divide things into smaller and smaller sub-groups—but this method depends wholly on nous.  (Cf. Posterior Analytics, II.13.)  Some modern Empiricist commentators, embarrassed by such mystical-sounding doctrines, warn that this emphasis on non-discursive reasoning collapses into pure rationalism (or Platonism), but this is a caricature.  What Aristotle means by rational “intuition” is not a matter of pure, disembodied thought.  One does not arrive at first principles by closing one’s eyes and retreating from the world (as with Cartesian introspection).  For Aristotle, first principles arise through a vigorous interaction of the empirical with the rational; a combination of rationality and sense experience produces the first seeds of human understanding.

Note that Aristotle believes that there are first principles (koinai archai) that are common to all fields of inquiry, such as the principle of non-contradiction or the law of excluded middle, and that each specialized science has its own first principles.  We may recover these first principles second-hand by a (dialectical) review of authorities.  Or, we can derive them first hand by analysis, by dividing the subject matter we are concerned with into its constituent parts.  At the beginning of the Physics, Aristotle explains, “What is to us plain and obvious at first is rather confused masses, the elements and principles of which become known to us later by analysis. Thus we must advance from generalities to particulars; for it is a whole that is best known to sense-perception, and a generality is a kind of whole, comprehending many things within it, like parts.  . . .  Similarly a child begins by calling all men ‘father,’ and all women ‘mother,’ but later on distinguishes each of them.”  (I.1.184a22-184b14, Hardie, Gaye.)  Just as children learn to distinguish their parents from other human beings, those who successfully study a science learn to distinguish the different natural kinds that make up the whole of a scientific phenomenon.  This precedes the work of induction and deduction already discussed. Once we have the parts (or the aspects), we can reason about them scientifically.

14. Rhetoric

Argumentation theorists (less aptly characterized as informal logicians) have critiqued the ascendancy of formal logic, complaining that the contemporary penchant for symbolic logic leaves one with an abstract mathematics of empty signs that cannot be applied in any useful way to larger issues.  Proponents of formal logic counter that their specialized formalism allows for a degree of precision otherwise not available and that any focus on the substantive meaning or truth of propositions is a distraction from logical issues per se.  We cannot readily fit Aristotle into one camp or the other.  Although he does provide a formal analysis of the syllogism, he intends logic primarily as a means of acquiring true statements about the world.  He also engages in an enthusiastic investigation of less rigorous forms of reasoning included in the study of dialectic and rhetoric.

Understanding precisely what Aristotle means by the term “dialectics” (dialektike) is no easy task.  He seems to view it as the technical study of argument in general or perhaps as a more specialized investigation into argumentative dialogue.  He intends his rhetoric (rhetorike), which he describes as the counterpart to dialectic, as an expansive study of the art of persuasion, particularly as it is directed towards a non-academic public.  Suffice it to say, for our purposes, that Aristotle reserves a place in his logic for a general examination of all arguments, for scientific reasoning, for rhetoric, for debating techniques of various sorts, for jurisprudential pleading, for cross-examination, for moral reasoning, for analysis, and for non-discursive intuition.

Aristotle distinguishes between what I will call, for convenience, rigorous logic and persuasive logic.  Rigorous logic aims at epistē, true belief about what is eternal, necessary, universal, and unchanging.  (Aristotle sometimes qualifies this to include “for the most part” scientific knowledge.)  Persuasive logic aims at acceptable, probable, or convincing belief (what we might call “opinion” instead of knowledge.)  It deals with approximate truth, with endoxa (popular or proverbial opinions), with reasoning that is acceptable to a particular audience, or with claims about accidental properties and contingent events.  Persuasive syllogisms have the same form as rigorous syllogisms but are understood as establishing their conclusions in a weaker manner.  As we have already seen, rigorous logic produces deductive and inductive syllogisms; Aristotle indicates that persuasive logic produces, in a parallel manner, enthymemes, analogies, and examples.  He defines an enthymeme as a deduction “concerned with things which may, generally speaking, be other than they are,” with matters that are “for the most part only generally true,”  or with “probabilities and signs”  (Rhetoric, I.2.1357a, Roberts).  He also mentions that the term “enthymeme” may refer to arguments with missing premises.  (Rhetoric, 1.2.1357a16-22.)  When it comes to induction, Aristotle’s presentation is more complicated, but we can reconstruct what he means in a more straightforward manner.

The persuasive counterpart to the inductive syllogism is the analogy and the example, but the example is really a composite argument formed from first, an analogy and second, an enthymeme.  Some initial confusion is to be expected as Aristotle’s understanding of analogies differs somewhat from contemporary accounts.  In contemporary treatments, analogies depend on a direct object(s)-to-object(s) comparison.  Aristotelian analogy, on the other hand, involves reasoning up to a general principle.  We are to conclude (1) that because individual things of a certain nature X have property z, everything that possesses nature X has property z.  But once we know that every X possesses property z, we can make a deduction (2) that some new example of nature X will also have property z.  Aristotle calls (1), the inductive movement up to the generalization, an analogy (literally, an argument from likeness=ton homoion); he calls (2), the deductive movement down to a new case, an enthymeme; and he considers (1) + (2), the combination of the analogy and the enthymeme together, an example (paradeigma).  He presents the following argument from example in the Rhetoric (I.2.1357b31-1358a1).  Suppose we wish to argue that Dionysus, the ruler, is asking for a bodyguard in order to set himself up as despot.  We can establish this by a two-step process.  First, we can draw a damning analogy between previous cases where rulers asked for a bodyguard and induce a general rule about such practices.  We can insist that Peisistratus, Theagenes, and other known tyrants, were scheming to make themselves despots, that Peisistratus, Theagenes, and other known tyrants also asked for a bodyguard, and that therefore, everyone who asks for a bodyguard is scheming to make themselves dictators.  But once we have established this general rule, we can move on to the second step in our argument, using this conclusion as a premise in an enthymeme.  We can argue that all people asking for a bodyguard are scheming to make themselves despots, that Dionysius is someone asking for a bodyguard, and that therefore, Dionysius must be scheming to make himself despot.  This is not, in Aristotle’s mind, rigorous reasoning.  Nonetheless, we can, in this way, induce probable conclusions and then use them to deduce probable consequences.  Although these arguments are intended to be persuasive or plausible rather than scientific, but the reasoning strategy mimics the inductive-deductive movement of science (without compelling, of course, the same degree of belief).

We should point out that Aristotle does not restrict himself to a consideration of purely formal issues in his discussion of rhetoric.  He famously distinguishes, for example, between three means of persuasion: ethos, pathos, and logos.  As we read, at the beginning of his Rhetoric: “Of the modes of persuasion furnished by the spoken word there are three kinds. . . . [Firstly,] persuasion is achieved by the speaker's personal character when the speech is so spoken as to make us think him credible. . . . Secondly, persuasion may come through the hearers, when the speech stirs their emotions. . . . Thirdly, persuasion is effected through the speech itself when we have proved [the point] by means of the persuasive arguments suitable to the case in question.”  (Rhetoric, I.2.1356a2-21, Roberts.)  Aristotle concludes that effective arguers must (1) understand morality and be able to convince an audience that they themselves are good, trustworthy people worth listening to (ethos); (2) know the general causes of emotion and be able to elicit them from specific audience (pathos); and (3) be able to use logical techniques to make convincing (not necessarily sound) arguments (logos).  Aristotle broaches many other issues we cannot enter into here.  He acknowledges that the goal of rhetoric is persuasion, not truth.  Such techniques may be bent to immoral or dishonest ends.  Nonetheless, he insists that it is in the public interest to provide a comprehensive and systematic survey of the field.

We might mention two other logical devices that have a place in Aristotle’s work: the topos and the aporia.  Unfortunately, Aristotle never explicitly explains what a topos is.  The English word “topic” does not do justice to the original notion, for although Aristotelian topoi may be organized around subject matter, they focus more precisely on recommended strategies for successful arguing.  (The technical term derives from a Greek word referring to a physical location.  Some scholars suggest a link to ancient mnemonic techniques that superimposed lists on familiar physical locations as a memory aid.)  In relevant discussions (in the Topics and the Rhetoric) Aristotle offers helpful advice about finding (or remembering) suitable premises, about verbally out-manoeuvring an opponent, about finding forceful analogies, and so on.  Examples of specific topoi would include discussions about how to argue which is the better of two alternatives, how to substitute terms effectively, how to address issues about genus and property, how to argue about cause and effect, how to conceive of sameness and difference, and so on.  Some commentators suggest that different topoi may have been used in a classroom situation in conjunction with student exercises and standardized texts, or with written lists of endoxa, or even with ready-made arguments that students were expected to memorize.

An aporia is a common device in Greek philosophy.  The Greek word aporia (plural, aporiai) refers to a physical location blocked off by obstacles where there is no way out; by extension, it means, in philosophy, a mental perplexity, an impasse, a paradox or puzzle that stoutly resists solution.  Aristotle famously suggests that philosophers begin with aporiai and complete their task by resolving the apparent paradoxes.  An attentive reader will uncover many aporiai in Aristotle who begins many of his treatises with a diaporia, a survey of the puzzles that occupied previous thinkers.  Note that aporiai cannot be solved through some mechanical rearrangement of symbolic terms.  Solving puzzles requires intelligence and discernment; it requires some creative insight into what is at stake.

15. Fallacies

In a short work entitled Sophistical Refutations, Aristotle introduces a theory of logical fallacies that has been remarkably influential.  His treatment is abbreviated and somewhat obscure, and there is inevitably scholarly disagreement about precise exegesis.  Aristotle thinks of fallacies as instances of specious reasoning; they are not merely errors but hidden errors.  A fallacy is an incorrect reasoning strategy that gives the illusion of being sound or somehow conceals the underlying problem.  Aristotle divides fallacies into two broad categories: those which depend on language (sometimes called verbal fallacies) and those that are independent of language (sometimes called material fallacies).  There is some scholarly disagreement about particular fallacies, but traditional English names and familiar descriptions follow.  Linguistic fallacies include: homonymy (verbal equivocation), ambiguity (amphiboly or grammatical equivocation), composition (confusing parts with a whole), division (confusing a whole with parts), accent (equivocation that arises out of mispronunciation or misplaced emphasis) and figure of speech (ambiguity resulting from the form of an expression).  Independent fallacies include accident (overlooking exceptions), converse accident (hasty generalization or improper qualification), irrelevant conclusion, affirming the consequent (assuming an effect guarantees the presence of one possible cause), begging the question (assuming the point), false cause, and complex question (disguising two or more questions as one).  Logicians, influenced by scholastic logic, often gave these characteristic mistakes Latin names: compositio for composition, divisio for division, secundum quid et simpliciter for converse accident, ignoranti enlenchi for nonrelevant conclusion, and petitio principii for begging the question.

Consider three brief examples of fallacies from Aristotle’s original text.  Aristotle formulates the following amphiboly (which admittedly sounds awkward in English): “I wish that you the enemy may capture.”  (Sophistical Refutations, 4.166a7-8, Pickard-Cambridge.)  Clearly, the grammatical structure of the statement leaves it ambiguous as to whether the speaker is hoping that the enemy or “you” be captured.  In discussing complex question, he supplies the following perplexing example: “Ought one to obey the wise or one’s father?”  (Ibid., 12.173a21.)  Obviously, from a Greek perspective, one ought to obey both.  The problem is that the question has been worded in such a way that anyone who answers will be forced to reject one moral duty in order to embrace the other.  In fact, there are two separate questions here—Should one obey the wise?  Should one obey one’s father?—that have been illegitimately combined to produce a single question with a single answer.  Finally, Aristotle provides the following time-honoured example of affirming the consequent: “Since after the rain the ground is wet, we suppose that if the ground is wet, it has been raining; whereas that does not necessarily follow”  (Ibid., 5.167b5-8.)  Aristotle’s point is that assuming that the same effect never has more than one cause misconstrues the true nature of the world.  The same effect may have several causes.  Many of Aristotle’s examples have to do with verbal tricks which are entirely unconvincing—for example, the person who commits the fallacy of division by arguing that the number “5” is both even and odd because it can be divided into an even and an odd number: “2” and “3.”  (Ibid., 4.166a32-33.)  But the interest here is theoretical: figuring out where an obviously-incorrect argument or proposition went wrong.  We should note that much of this text, which deals with natural language argumentation, does not presuppose the syllogistic form.  Aristotle does spend a good bit of time considering how fallacies are related to one another.  Fallacy theory, it is worth adding, is a thriving area of research in contemporary argumentation theory.  Some of these issues are hotly debated.

16. Moral Reasoning

In the modern world, many philosophers have argued that morality is a matter of feelings, not reason.  Although Aristotle recognizes the connative (or emotional) side of morality, he takes a decidedly different tack.  As a virtue ethicist, he does not focus on moral law but views morality through the lens of character.  An ethical person develops a capacity for habitual decision-making that aims at good, reliable traits such as honesty, generosity, high-mindedness, and courage.  To modern ears, this may not sound like reason-at-work, but Aristotle argues that only human beings—that is, rational animals—are able to tell the difference between right and wrong.  He widens his account of rationality to include a notion of practical wisdom (phronesis), which he defines as “a true and reasoned state of capacity to act with regard to the things that are good or bad for man.”  (Nicomachean Ethics, VI.5.1140b4-5, Ross, Urmson).  The operation of practical wisdom, which is more about doing than thinking, displays an inductive-deductive pattern similar to science as represented in Figure 3.  It depends crucially on intuition or nous.  One induces the idea of specific virtues (largely, through an exercise of non-discursive reason) and then deduces how to apply these ideas to particular circumstances.  (Some scholars make a strict distinction between “virtue” (areté) understood as the mental capacity which induces moral ideas and “phronesis” understood as the mental capacity which applies these ideas, but the basic structure of moral thinking remains the same however strictly or loosely we define these two terms.)

Figure 3

The Inductive-Deductive Method of Aristotelian Ethics

We can distinguish then between moral induction and moral deduction.  In moral induction, we induce an idea of courage, honesty, loyalty, and so on.  We do this over time, beginning in our childhood, through habit and upbringing.  Aristotle writes that the successful moral agent “must be born with an eye, as it were, by which to judge rightly and choose what is truly good.”  (Ibid., VI.7.1114b6ff.)  Once this intuitive capacity for moral discernment has been sufficiently developed—once the moral eye is able to see the difference between right and wrong,—we can apply moral norms to the concrete circumstances of our own lives.  In moral deduction, we go on to apply the idea of a specific virtue to a particular situation.  We do not do this by formulating moral arguments inside our heads, but by making reasonable decisions, by doing what is morally required given the circumstances.  Aristotle refers, in this connection, to the practical syllogism which results “in a conclusion which is an action.” (Movement of Animals, 701a10ff, Farquharson.)  Consider a (somewhat simplified) example.   Suppose I induce the idea of promise-keeping as a virtue and then apply it to question of whether I should pay back the money I borrowed from my brother.  The corresponding theoretical syllogism would be:  Promise-keeping is good; giving back the money I owe my brother is an instance of promise-keeping; so giving the back the money I owe my brother is good.”  In the corresponding practical syllogism, I do not conclude with a statement:  “this act is good.”  I go out and pay back the money I owe my brother.  The physical exchange of money counts as the conclusion.  In Aristotle’s moral system, general moral principles play the role of an ostensible definition in science.  One induces a general principle and deduces a corresponding action.  Aristotle does believe that moral reasoning is a less rigorous form of reasoning than science, but chiefly because scientific demonstrations deal with universals whereas the practical syllogism ends a single act that must be fitted to contingent circumstances.  There is never any suggestion that morality is somehow arbitrary or subjective.  One could set out the moral reasoning process using the moral equivalent of an inductive syllogism and a scientific demonstration.

Although Aristotle provides a logical blueprint for the kind of reasoning that is going on in ethical decision-making, he obviously does not view moral decision-making as any kind of mechanical or algorithmic procedure.  Moral induction and deduction represent, in simplified form, what is going on.  Throughout his ethics, Aristotle emphasizes the importance of context.  The practice of morality depends then on a faculty of keen discernment that notices, distinguishes, analyzes, appreciates, generalizes, evaluates, and ultimately decides.  In the Nicomachean Ethics, he includes practical wisdom in his list of five intellectual virtues.  (Scholarly commentators variously explicate the relationship between the moral and the intellectual virtues.)  Aristotle also discusses minor moral virtues such as good deliberation (eubulia), theoretical moral understanding (sunesis), and experienced moral judgement (gnome).  And he equates moral failure with chronic ignorance or, in the case of weakness of will (akrasia), with intermittent ignorance.

17. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Complete Works of Aristotle.  Edited by Jonathan Barnes.  Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1984.
    • The standard scholarly collection of translations.
  • Aristotle in 23 Volumes.  Cambridge, M.A.: Harvard University Press; London: William Heinemann Ltd., 1944 and 1960.
    • A scholarly, bilingual edition.

b. Secondary Sources

This list is intended as a window on a diversity of approaches and problems.

  • Barnes, Jonathan, (Aristotle) Posterior Analytics. Oxford: Clarendon Press; New York : Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Biondi, Paolo.  Aristotle: Posterior Analytics II.19.  Quebec, Q.C.: Les Presses de l’Universite Laval, 2004.
  • Ebbesen, Sten, Commentators and Commentaries on Aristotle’s Sophistici Elenchi, Vol. 1: The Greek Tradition. Leiden: Brill, 1981.
  • Engberg-Pedersen, Troels.  “More on Aristotelian Epagoge.” Phronesis, 24 (1979): 301-319.
  • Englebretsen, George.  Three Logicians: Aristotle, Leibnitz, and Sommers and the Syllogistic.  Assen, Netherlands: Van Gorcum, 1981.
    • See also Sommers, below.
  • Garrett, Dan, and Edward Barbanell.  Encyclopedia of Empiricism. Westport, Conn.: Greenwood Press, 1997.
  • Govier, Trudy.  Problems in Argument Analysis and Evaluation.  Providence, R.I.: Floris, 1987.
  • Groarke, Louis. “A Deductive Account of Induction,” Science et Esprit, 52 (December 2000), 353-369.
  • Groarke, Louis. An Aristotelian Account of Induction: Creating Something From Nothing.  Montreal & Kingston: McGill-Queen’s University Press, 2009.
  • Hamlyn, D. W.  Aristotle’s De Anima Books II and III.  Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1974.
  • Hamlyn, D. W. “Aristotelian Epagoge.”  Phronesis 21 (1976): 167-184.
  • Irwin, Terence.  Aristotle’s First Principles.  Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1988.
  • Keyt, David.  “Deductive Logic,” in A Companion to Aristotle, George Anaganostopoulos, London: Blackwell, 2009, pp. 31-50.
  • Łukasiewicz, Jan.  Aristotle's Syllogistic from the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic. Oxford University Press, 1957.
  • McCaskey, John, “Freeing Aristotelian Epagôgê from Prior Analytics II 23,” Apeiron, 40:4 (December, 2007), pp. 345–74.
  • McKirahan, Richard Jr.  Principles and Proofs: Aristotle’s Theory of Demonstrative Species.  Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Parry, William, and Edward Hacker. Aristotelian Logic. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Peters, F. E., Greek Philosophical Terms: A Historical Lexicon.  New York: NYU Press, 1967.
  • Rijk, Lambertus Marie de.  Aristotle: Semantics and Ontology.  Boston, M.A.: Brill, 2002.
  • Smith, Robin.  “Aristotle on the Uses of Dialectic,” Synthese , Vol. 96, No. 3, 1993, 335-358.
  • Smith, Robin. Aristotle, Prior Analytics.  Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1989.
  • Smith, Robin. “Aristotle’s Logic,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. E, Zalta. ed. Stanford, CA., 2000, 2007.
    • An excellent introduction to Aristotle’s logic (with a different focus).
  • Smith, Robin. “Aristotle’s Theory of Demonstration,” in A Companion to Aristotle, 52-65.
  • Sommers, Fred, and George Englebretsen, An Invitation to Formal Reasoning: The Logic of Terms. Aldershot UK: Ashgate, 2000.


Author Information

Louis F. Groarke
St. Francis Xavier University

Michel Foucault: Ethics

The French philosopher and historian Michel Foucault (1926-1984) does not understand ethics as moral philosophy, the metaphysical and epistemological investigation of ethical concepts (metaethics) and the investigation of the criteria for evaluating actions (normative ethics), as Anglo-American philosophers do.  Instead, he defines ethics as a relation of self to itself in terms of its moral agency.  More specifically, ethics denotes the intentional work of an individual on itself in order to subject itself to a set of moral recommendations for conduct and, as a result of this self-forming activity or “subjectivation,” constitute its own moral being.

The classical works of Foucault’s ethics are his historical studies of ancient sexual ethics in The Use of Pleasure and The Care of the Self, in addition to the late interviews “On the Genealogy of Ethics” and “The Ethics for the Concern of Self as a Practice of Freedom.”  The publication of his final three lecture courses at the Collège de France in 1982-3 considerably enhance how those texts are to be understood and provide original resources.  The Hermeneutics of the Subject provides greater insight into the ancient ethics of caring for self and how Foucault perceives it in relation to the history of philosophy.  Both The Government of Self and Others and The Courage of Truth – his final courses, respectively – make it manifest that he considered the ancient ethical practice of parrhesia or frank-speech central to ancient ethics and, indeed, important to his own philosophical practice.

The significance of this so-called ‘ethical turn’ for Foucault’s philosophy is displayed in the controversial terms through which he ultimately expressed the purpose of his work.  He lays claim to the spirit of the tradition of critical philosophy established by Immanuel Kant, and Foucault purports to exemplify this spirit by disclosing, or telling the truth about, the historical conditions of the contingent constraints that we impose on ourselves and, in doing so, opening possibilities for autonomous ethical relations.  Foucault’s claim to the spirit of critical philosophy has received, and continues to receive, criticism and considerable discussion in the scholarly literature.  Of central concern are the compatibility of his claim to critical philosophy as an ethical practice and his broader views about subjectivity, and whether his critical analysis of modern ethics is meant to be merely descriptive or also evaluative.

The primary focus of this article is the nature of ethics as Foucault conceives it, and it is unpacked by discussion of his published historical studies of ancient Greek and Roman ethics.  The article then considers his treatment of the ancient ethical injunction of the care of the self and parrhesia, transitioning into a presentation of, and opinions about, his alleged ethical turn and the contentious role that ethics might play in his critical philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. The ‘Ethical Turn’
  2. Morality and Ethics
  3. The Elements of Ethical Relations
    1. The Ethical Substance (Ontology)
    2. Mode of Subjection (Deontology)
    3. Ethical Work (Ascetics)
    4. Telos (Teleology)
  4. The Care of the Self
    1. Caring for Oneself and Knowing Oneself
    2. Parrhesia (Frank-Speech)
  5. Ethics and Critical Philosophy
    1. Kant and Foucault
    2. Critique and Parrhesia
    3. Parrhesia and Self-Legislation
    4. The Problem of Normativity and the Aesthetics of Existence
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources and Abbreviations
    2. Select Secondary Sources

1. The ‘Ethical Turn’

As important as ethics becomes in Foucault’s later thought, prior to 1981 he rarely touches on themes directly related to either ethics or morality.  One rare, short, but not unimportant analysis occurs in The Order of Things.  There, Foucault maintains that modern ethical thought attempts to derive moral obligations from human nature and yet modern thought also holds that human nature can never be, given the fact of human finitude, fully given to human knowledge.  Consequently, modern thought is incapable of coherently formulating a set of moral obligations (OT 326-7; see also PPC 49).  This argument is, essentially, one piece of his larger attack on modern humanism and its conception of the human being as subject, a being that supplies for itself the foundations of knowledge, value, and freedom.  Discipline and Punish and the first volume of The History of Sexuality further this line of criticism, insisting on the historical constitution of the subject by discursive practices and techniques of power (see, for example, FL 67, PK 117, EW3 3-4, DP 30).  In short, his writings through the 1970’s comprise a multifaceted attack on the modern notion of self-constitution.

It is surprising to many commentators, then, that by 1982 Foucault elaborated a framework for his work that grants self-constitution considerable importance.  He explains his “history of thought” as a history of “focal points of experience,” the persistently occurring ways in which humans conceive and perceive themselves – as mad, diseased, sexual, and so forth.  These focal points are studied along three axes:  the axis of knowledge, or the rules of discursive practices that determine what counts as true or false; the axis of power, or the rationalities and techniques by which one governs the conduct of others; and the axis of ethics, or the practices of self through which an individual constitutes itself as a subject (GSO 1-5).  Richard Bernstein aptly characterizes the scholarly reaction to Foucault’s introduction of ethics when the former states the ethical thematic seems to presume the concept of a self-constituting subject that latter’s earlier work sought to criticize (Bernstein 1994; see also Milchman and Rosenberg 2007).

Foucault never did articulate a clear position on the conceptual fit between his critique of the modern subject and his account of ethics.  Nevertheless, he does provide some clues as to the nature of his mature position.  Late in his life he admits that his earlier work was too insistent on the formation of subjectivity by discursive practices and power-relations (EW1 177, 225).  Now, his focus is on the subject as both constituted and self-constituting, or the point at which discursive practices and power-relations dovetail with ethics.  Of course, this does not decisively resolve the problem, but it does suggest a rereading of his earlier works more conducive to the notion of self-constitution.  In fact, in later writings and interviews Foucault supports this interpretation when he explains that all the axes of analysis existed in a confused manner (EW1 262); he even retrospectively interprets his work as fitting one or more of those axes (EW1 202-5).  By admitting that, first, all three axes of analysis existed in earlier works, and, second, that the goal of his work is to study the connection of knowledge and power with ethics, Foucault suggests that there is no ethical turn.  Of course, this does not license the commentator to avoid the potentially problematic conceptual fit between Foucault’s mature conception of subjectivity and his earlier critique of the self-constituting subject.  However, it does appear to be the case that Foucault is suggesting that he is best read backwards rather than forwards.

Whatever the case may be, Foucault’s introduction of ethics added an undeniable richness to his thought that also transformed how his earlier work is to be interpreted.

2. Morality and Ethics

The most elaborate discussion of ethics that Foucault provides appears in Section Three of the Introduction to The Use of Pleasure.  There, he designates ethics as one of the three primary areas of morality.  In addition to ethics, morality consists of both a moral code and the concrete acts of moral agents.  The former consists of the more or less explicitly formulated values and rules recommended to individuals by the “prescriptive agencies” (for example, family, church, work, and so forth) in which they participate.  The latter refers to the actions of historically real persons insofar as those actions comply or fail to comply with, obey or resist, or respect or disrespect the values and rules prescribed to them by prescriptive agencies.

In addition to a moral code and the real behaviors of individuals, Foucault claims that morality also consists of a third area, namely, ethics.  He commonly and pithily defines it as a relation of the subject to itself, but a more technical definition of ethics is the conduct required of an individual so as to render its own actions consistent with a moral code and standards of moral approval.  For Foucault, conduct is a category that is broader than moral agency and includes both non-moral actions and the exercising of non-agential capacities (for example, attitudes, demeanor, and so forth).  Ethical conduct, then, consists of the actions performed and capacities exercised intentionally by a subject for the purpose of engaging in morally approved conduct.  Suppose, for example, that an individual adopts the prescription of sexual fidelity to her partner.  In this case, ethics concerns not her morally satisfactory conduct that directly satisfies her duty of being faithful to her partner, but rather the conduct through which she enables or brings herself to behave in a way that is sexually faithful to her partner.

Consistent with his distinction between moral conduct and ethical conduct, Foucault also distinguishes between moral obligations and ethical obligations.  A moral obligation is an imperative of a moral code that either requires or forbids a specific kind of conduct, whereas an ethical obligation is a prescription for conduct that is a necessary condition for producing morally approved conduct.  Foucault understands morally approved conduct to be a wide category, as it does not designate just those acts that comply with a moral code – which is, he thinks, a manifestly modern conception of moral approval.  As he is keen to show in his volumes on ancient sexuality, rigorously stylizing one’s daily existence according to self-imposed standards of conduct was at one time the measure of moral approval, and such approval was not limited to conformity to a moral code.  In this regard, the moral valorization of conduct might be, as it was with the ancients, weighted toward the satisfaction of ethical obligations, or, as it is in modernity, weighted toward the satisfaction of the moral obligations that comprise a moral code.

3. The Elements of Ethical Relations

On Foucault’s account, ethical relations are constituted by four formal elements, the contents of which are subject to historical variation:  the ontological element or “ethical substance,” the deontological element or “mode of subjection,” the ascetic element or “ethical work,” and the teleological element or “telos.”  His project in The Use of Pleasure and The Care of the Self is to articulate the sexual ethics in ancient Greece and Rome, respectively, by describing these elements and uncovering the primary ethical obligations for sexual conduct for both epochs.  These ethical obligations are, Foucault contends, deducible by analyzing the four primary themes of sexual austerity expressed throughout all of Western history: the relation one has to one’s own body and health, wives and marriage, boys, and truth.  Although these themes are occasionally mentioned below, the the focus of this section is on the four elements of ethical relations.

a. The Ethical Substance (Ontology)

The ethical substance is the material or aspect of self that is morally problematic, taken as the object of one’s ethical reflection, and transformed in one’s ethical work.  In The Use of Pleasure Foucault maintains that the ethical substance of ancient Greek sexual ethics – an ethics that was exclusively for men of the right inherited social status – was the aphrodisia or the broad range of acts, gestures, and contacts associated with pleasures to promote the propagation of the species and considered the inferior pleasures given their commonality with all animals.  The intensity of the aphrodisia induced the majority of men to behave immoderately with regard to it, and since the moral telos of ancient Greek ethics was a moderate state in which a man had succeeded in mastering his pleasures, the immoderate man was considered by ethicists to be shameful and dishonorable for allowing the inferior part of his soul to enslave his superior part.  It was also considered shameful for a man to experiment or delight in pleasures derived from the passive and subordinate rather than active and dominant role in sexual relations, the latter assigned by nature to men and the former assigned to those incapable of mastering themselves of their own power, namely, women and children.  By violating these limits out of a failure to master himself, the Greek man put himself in the position of compromising his health, household, social standing, and political ambitions.

Foucault maintains in The Care of the Self that aphrodisia remains the ethical substance for Roman sexual ethics.  But unlike the Greek ethicists before them, Roman ethicists conceived the aphrodisia as essentially and intrinsically dangerous rather than dangerous merely because of the fact that their intensity induces immoderate conduct.  According to Foucault, Roman ethicists stipulated that although sexual acts are good by nature, since nature is perfect in its designs, those acts are nevertheless fraught with a dangerous and essential passivity that causes involuntary movements of the body and soul and expenditure of the life forces.  Nature has, as it were, designed sex as good and beneficial but only on the condition that it conforms to its designs.  Thus, although sexual acts themselves were not considered intrinsically bad, when one performed a sexual act without adequate attention to both its dangers and nature’s limits for it one risked exposing both body and soul to illnesses; indeed, acting without consideration for these dangers was a sign that the soul had already been corrupted.  Foucault therefore asserts that the perception of the dangerous physical and spiritual effects of unrestrained sexual activity led to a moral and medical discourse about sex different in kind than that of ancient Greek ethical discourse.  It focused more on moderated use as a means of achieving physical and spiritual health rather than excellence.

b. Mode of Subjection (Deontology)

The mode of subjection is the way in which the individual establishes its relation to the moral code, recognizes itself as bound to act according to it, and is entitled to view its acts as worthy of moral valorization.  The mode of subjection is, as Foucault refers to it, the ‘deontological’ or normative component of ethics.  For example, consider the obligation to help someone in need.  The Kantian holds that pure practical reason vis-à-vis the categorial imperative rationally requires the charitable act and it is praiseworthy to the extent that it is performed out of respect for reason.  The practitioner of Islam, on the other hand, holds that the charitable act is morally valorized to the extent that it is produced out of respect for God’s will as revealed in sacred texts.

The mode of subjection for the ancient Greeks was a man’s free, permanent, and noble choice to fashion his life into a beautiful work according to a program of self-mastery.  The notion of use (of pleasures) was what ancient Greeks used as a standard for measuring the beauty of a man’s work with regard to his sexual conduct.  The use of pleasures refers to how a man managed or integrated pleasures into his life such that their use did not compromise but benefitted his health and social standing.  Appropriate management submitted the use of pleasures to three strategies.  The strategy of need demanded that desires for pleasures should arise from nature alone and be fulfilled neither extravagantly nor as a result of artifice.  The strategy of timeliness required the distribution of pleasures at the right times of the day, year, and life so as to maintain the well-being of oneself, one’s wife, and potential offspring.  The strategy of status demanded that a man use his pleasures consistent with his inherited status, purposes, and responsibilities.

Foucault maintains that ancient Greek sexual ethics was stricter than their moral code, as a man suffered little moral condemnation for his choice of sexual relations, provided he was neither passive nor partnered with someone under another man’s authority.  But submitting oneself to this mode of subjection meant imposing ethical requirements on oneself that were not included in the moral code.  In fact, submitting oneself to this rigorous sexual ethics was seen as a noble and fine choice precisely because it was not morally required.

The mode of subjection for ancient Roman sexual ethics is also an aesthetics of existence, but Foucault is also clear that it is more austere than the Greek ethics that preceded it.  What this means is that Roman ethical obligations became stricter despite a loose moral code regarding sex.  The increased austerity of this ethics is due in part to the perception of an intrinsic passivity of sexual acts, and also because the means of responding to this passivity required greater attention to the rationality of nature (which is not be understood according to the distinction between what is normal and abnormal).  Roman ethicists conceived that the pleasures of sex were derived by involuntary and dangerous movements of the body and soul, and that seeking pleasure as the end of an act only furthered the possibility of corrupting both body and soul. Since for Roman ethicists nothing in nature seeks sexual pleasure as an end but only as a means to other natural goods (for example, procreation, health, spiritual well-being), they maintained that the pursuit of the aphrodisia as an end in itself could arise only from the distortion of the soul’s desires for pleasure.   Consequently, the criterion by which Roman ethicists evaluated sexual conduct was whether it was born of desire conformed to the wisdom of nature.  So, where the mode of subjection of ancient Greek sexual ethics was the use of pleasures, where proper use is exemplified as the strategic integration of the pleasures into one’s life, Roman ethicists understood that nature put universal features into the aphrodisia that were also the key to discovering the prescriptions for their use.

c. Ethical Work (Ascetics)

The ethical work consists of the self-forming activities meant to ensure one’s own subjection to a moral authority and transform oneself into an autonomous ethical agent.  Foucault refers to these self-forming activities as practices or technologies of the self, and also in the ancient sense of askēsis, or ascetic practices.  These practices are not to be conflated with an asceticism that strives for the goal of freeing oneself from all desires for physical pleasures.  To be sure, all ascetic practices are, Foucault thinks, organized around principles of self-restraint, self-discipline, and self-denial.  But not all ascetic practices aim at eliminating all of one’s desires for physical pleasures.

Foucault maintains that the ethical work to be performed in ancient sexual ethics is that of self-mastery.  For the ancient Greeks, mastering oneself is an agonistic battle with oneself, where victory is achieved through careful use of the pleasures according to need, timeliness, and social status.  Greek ethicists understood that this battle required regular training in addition to the knowledge of the things to which one ought to be attracted.  The sort of training a man undertook was aimed at self-mastery through practices of self-denial and abstention, which taught him to satisfy natural needs at the right time consistent with his social status.  The moral end of such practices was not to cultivate the attitude that abstention is a moral ideal, but rather to train him to become temperate and self-controlled.  As such, successful self-mastery was exhibited by the man who did not suppress his desires, but authoritatively controlled them in a way that contributed to his excellence and the beauty of his life.  Foucault suggests that this ideal is exemplified in the literature about the love of boys, which heroized the man who could express and maintain friendly love for a boy while at the same restraining his co-present erotic love

Foucault is clear in The Care of the Self that the ethical work in ancient Roman ethics is also self-mastery, and that the ethicists reconceived the nature of this kind of ethical work.  Instead of an agonistic relationship in which a man struggles to subdue and enslave his desires for pleasures (rather than be subdued and enslaved by them) through their proper use, the work of self-mastery for Roman ethics was forcing the desires for pleasures into proper alignment with the designs of nature.  While the same is true for ancient Greek ethics, the Roman ethicists emphasized it to such a degree that social status and, to an extent, sexual anatomy were abolished as being relevant factors in determining one’s ethical duties.  What becomes essential for this ethics is grasping that all pleasures that are not internal to oneself originate in desires that might not be capable of satisfaction, and whenever one chooses to engage such desires one subjects oneself to physical and spiritual risk.  In all things regarding the aphrodisia, then, careful attention must be paid to deciphering and testing which of one’s desires originate in nature, or maintain a consistency with nature, and which transgress the limits set by nature.

The intensification of the austerity of sexual ethics this change in self-mastery produced is emphasized in marital ethics.  Greek men were not morally required to maintain sexual relations with only their wives, but a man’s sexual conduct was especially excellent when he restrained his sexual activity to his wife.  For the Roman ethicists, however, a man failed to master himself if he pursued sexual relations with anyone other than his wife, for nature designed the man and woman to contribute to each other’s physical and spiritual well-being through their sexual activity together.  Their joint spiritual well-being was considered integral to the harmony of the human community.

d. Telos (Teleology)



The telos of an ethics is the ideal mode or state of being toward which one strives or aspires in their ethical work.  For the ancient Greeks the activity of self-mastery aimed at a state of moderation that was characterized as freedom in its fullest form, and it was understood as a man’s enslavement of his desires for pleasures to himself.  A man’s domination of his desires was expressed in domestic and political metaphors:  he must exhibit the constrained strategizing necessary for maintaining an orderly and stable rule over both his household or subordinates.  The man who controlled his use of pleasures made himself personally prosperous – physically excellent and socially estimable – in the same way that a household or nation prospers as the result of the careful and skilled governance of a manager or ruler, and a man was not expected to be successful in managing his household or exercising political authority and influence without first achieving victory over his pleasures.  The man who failed to master his pleasures and yet found himself in a position of authority over others was a candidate for tyranny, while the man who mastered his pleasures was considered the best candidate to govern.

Roman ethicists conceived the activity of self-mastery as aiming at a conversion of the self to itself, which they conceived as freedom in fullest form.  Through the ethical work of self-mastery an individual conformed their desires to the rationality of nature, which resulted in a detachment from anything not given by nature as an appropriate object of desire.  Roman ethicists did not understand the telos of self-mastery as the authority over pleasures that manifested itself in their strategic use, but rather it manifested itself as a disinterestedness and detachment from the pleasures such that one finds a non-physical, spiritual pleasure in belonging to the true self nature intends.  Nature does not recommend the mere pursuit of pleasures; it recommends the pursuit of pleasures insofar as those acts are consistent with other ends that it wants met.  Hence, the end of self-mastery is achieving a perfect consistency between one’s own desires and those that nature uses to promote its ends.  For this reason the freedom achieved through self-mastery is an autonomy with regard to that which is within one’s control, namely, conforming oneself to nature.

4. The Care of the Self

A major theme that emerges in Foucault’s final volumes of The History of Sexuality and his lectures at the Collège de France is the ethical obligation to care for oneself.  Foucault certainly claims in both those volumes that the care of self is foundational to ancient ethics (UP 73, 108, 211; CS 45-54), but curiously, and despite his titling of the third volume The Care of the Self, he does not provide significant discussion of the care of self in its generality.  Yet his final three lecture courses at the Collège de France attest to the fact that not only did he have a definite view about the care of the self, it is central to the history of philosophy and critical philosophy that he articulated at the end of his life.  This history emphasizes the integral relation between the care of self and the concern for truth, notably on display in the practice of parrhesia (frank-speech), as its central mode of expression.

a. Caring for Oneself and Knowing Oneself

The ancient notion of caring for oneself acquires prominence for Foucault in the first lecture of his 1981-2 course lecture at the Collège de France, The Hermeneutics of the Subject.  For the ancients, Foucault claims, the care of the self was the foundational principle of all moral rationality.  Today, however, caring for oneself is without moral content.  By explaining the ancient conception of the care of the self and its connection to the Delphic prescription to know oneself, famously observed by Socrates, Foucault wishes to diagnose the exclusion of the care of the self by modern thought and consider whether, given his diagnosis, the care of the self might remain viable in modern ethics.

The exclusion of the care of the self is the result of a reconception of two ancient injunctions:  care for oneself and know oneself.  These two injunctions were originally expressed by Socrates – the exemplar par excellence, Foucault thinks, of the person who cares for himself – with the care of the self serving as the justification for the prescription to know oneself.  According to Foucault, Socrates and ancient ethicists understood that caring for oneself was to exhibit an attitude not only toward oneself but also toward others and the world, attend to one’s own thoughts and attitudes in self-reflection and meditation, and engage in ascetic practices aimed at realizing an ideal state of being.  The prescription to know oneself was the means through which one cared for oneself, and Socrates cared for his own soul and the souls of others by using the practice of dialectic to force the examination of the truth of his own thought and conduct and that of his interlocutors.  The salient point for Foucault is that Socrates did not practice philosophy merely as a means of arriving at true propositions.  Instead, his program was to use philosophy as a tool for examining and testing the consistency of the rational discourse he and his interlocutors employed to justify their lives and conduct.  Foucault sees this as a philosophical activity that is fundamentally oriented to the care of the self, for truth is pursued in philosophy for its own good and the sake of ethical development.  Philosophy is by Socrates’ lights a practice essential to one’s ethical development, for it is a spiritual commitment to the truth that requires self-disciplined attention to the character of one’s thinking.

Foucault therefore distinguishes between philosophy simpliciter and philosophy as a spiritual activity.  Philosophy considers what enables, conditions, and limits the subject’s access to the truth.  But philosophy as a spiritual activity – or philosophy undertaken according to the injunction to care for oneself – is philosophy conceived as ethical work that must be performed in order for an individual to gain access to the truth.  This is not to say, of course, that philosophy as a spiritual activity does not seek to acquire knowledge of things as they are.  Rather, it is to say that such knowledge requires right conduct in addition to the justification of a true belief.

The injunction to know oneself was therefore a demand to attend to one’s relationship to the truth as a function of caring for oneself.  A decisive change occurs, however, with the “Cartesian moment” (HS 14).  The kind of self-knowledge that René Descartes seeks in his Meditations on First Philosophy and Rules for the Direction of the Mind is self-evidence or that which would decisively determine the truth or falsity of a proposition through its apparent clarity and distinctness.  Now, knowing oneself becomes merely a necessary epistemic, and not moral, condition for gaining access to the truth.  (The Cartesian moment takes further hold, Foucault explains, in the philosophy of Immanuel Kant, who argues in his Critique of Pure Reason that features of the subject’s own thinking must be constitutive of the very possibility of knowledge.)  Consequently, attending to oneself becomes judging the truth of a proposition, and self-knowledge is not a directive for spiritual and ethical development.  In modernity philosophy is, for the most part (compare HS 28, where Foucault adds some qualification), not the activity of ethical transformation that aims at the existence transformed by truth.

The modern shift in the construal of self-knowledge as self-evidence required changes in moral rationality.  Modern thought construes moral self-examination as the act of determining whether one’s intentions or acts are consistent with moral obligations.  One’s moral existence is therefore reduced to whether or not one satisfies one’s moral obligations, which had the consequence that the care of the self is perceived as either amoral egoism (because it is unconcerned with the foundations of moral obligation) or melancholic withdrawal (because one cannot know one’s moral obligations).  But this is predicated upon a fundamental misconception of the care of the self.  The care of the self is the ethical transformation of the self in light of the truth, which is to say the transformation of the self into a truthful existence.

b. Parrhesia (Frank-Speech)

In the final two years of his life, Foucault began to focus his attention on a particular ancient practice of caring for the self, namely, parrhesia (alternatively, parresia) or frank-speech.  Parrhesia is the courageous act of telling the truth without either embellishment or concealment for the purpose of criticizing oneself or another.  This practice and its history are the objects of his final two lecture courses at the College de France, The Government of Self and Others and The Courage of Truth, in addition to a series of lectures, “Discourse and Truth” (compiled as Fearless Speech), given at the University of California, Berkeley in the fall of 1983.  The chief object of concern is parrhesia as a practice of self that is centered on the relation of the subject to truth, and how through engaging in parrhesia one freely constitutes one’s subjectivity.

Foucault stipulates that there are five features of the parrhesiastic act.  First, the speaker must express his own opinion directly; that is, he must express his opinion without (or by minimizing) rhetorical flourish and make it plain that it is his opinion.  Second, parrhesia requires that the speaker knows that he speaks the truth and that he speaks the truth because he knows what he says is in fact true.  His expressed opinion is verified by his sincerity and courage, which points to the third feature, namely, danger:  it is only when someone risks some kind of personal harm that his speech constitutes parrhesia.  Fourth, the function of parrhesia is not merely to state the truth, but to state it as an act of criticizing oneself (for example, an admission) or another.  Finally, the parrhesiastes speaks the truth as a duty to himself and others, which means he is free to keep silent but respects the truth by imposing upon himself the requirement to speak it as an act of freedom (FS 11-20; see also GSO 66-7).

It is in Socrates, Foucault says, that the care of the self first manifests itself as parrhesia.  (But not only Socrates; Foucault considers parrhesiastic practices throughout the ancient Greek and Roman epochs.)  The essence of Socratic parrhesia is located in his focus on the harmony between the way one lives (Greek:  bios) and the rational discourse or account (Greek:  logos) one might or might not possess that would justify the way one lives.  Socrates himself lived in a way that was in perfect conformity with his statements about how one ought to live, and those statements themselves were supported by a rigorous rational discourse defending their truth.  Because Socrates bound himself in his conduct to his own philosophically explored standards, his interlocutors understood him to be truly free.  Socrates’ harmony is the condition of his use of parrhesia in identifying and criticizing the lack of harmony in his interlocutors, with the aim of leading them to a life in which they will bind themselves in their own conduct to only those principles that they can put into a rational discourse.  Socratic parrhesia therefore manifests the care of the self because its intent is ethical, for it urges the interlocutor to pursue knowledge of what is true and conform their conduct to the truth as ethical work.

5. Ethics and Critical Philosophy

Ethics and critique emerged nearly simultaneously as objects of Foucault’s interest (1981 and 1978, respectively).  Whether or not that was accidental is an interesting area of scholarship.  But Foucault explicitly links them together in the much discussed essay, “What is Enlightenment?”, explaining that his project is critical philosophy precisely because it contributes to our abilities to autonomously fashion and constitute ourselves.  Thus, around Kant, Foucault combines critical philosophy and ethics, and that connection provides greater insight into just how Foucault conceives of ethics and the history of ethics in relation to his own project.  But his self-alignment with the tradition of critical philosophy has become the most contentious issue in the scholarship.  The criticisms are diverse, but all offer some version of the thesis that Foucault either rejects or lacks the normative criteria required for critique.

a. Kant and Foucault

Late in his life Foucault often claimed to be a descendant of the tradition of critical philosophy established by Kant.  However, it is evident that Foucault always maintained an interest in Kant’s philosophy, which is verified by his secondary thesis for his philosophy doctorate, a close reading of and commentary on Kant’s Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (see Foucault 2008).  Additionally, Foucault casually aligns himself rather broadly with critical philosophy in two other works from the 1960’s, The Birth of the Clinic (1963) and The Order of Things (1966) (BC xix; OT 342).  The received view of this period of his work, especially the secondary thesis and The Order of Things, is that it provides decisive evidence of his rejection of Kant’s attempt to place all rational conditions and constraints in the subject (for example, see Habermas 1986, Schmidt and Wartenburg 1994, Han 2002, Allen 2003).  Although Kant disappears from Foucault’s work as an object of explicit discussion, there is some indirect evidence found throughout his explicitly ethical writings that strongly suggests that the self-constituting subject is his target (see again PK 117, EW3 3-4, DP 30).

Kant reappears in Foucault’s thought in the 1978 address “What is Critique?” and he remains an object of attention until Foucault’s death in 1984.  In the later work Kant is no longer discussed seemingly negatively as the philosopher that grounds thought, action, and freedom in the subject’s self-legislated laws of reason, but rather the philosopher who in his 1784 essay “What is Enlightenment?” takes aim at the ways in which human beings arbitrarily constrain themselves in their present actuality.  Foucault departs from the Kantian critical project insofar as he does not seek to provide an “analytics of truth,” which would guarantee autonomous thinking and acting in universal and necessary principles (see, for example, “What Does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking,” 8:145, and Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, 4:431).  Instead, he controversially claims to promote autonomy by engaging in a critical-historical ontology of the present, the purpose of which is to disclose the singular and arbitrary constraints that we impose upon ourselves so that we might, should we possess the courage, constitute ourselves differently.  Or, as Foucault puts it, the goal is to determine “what is not or is no longer indispensable for the constitution of ourselves as autonomous subjects” (EW1 313).  (For more locations where Foucault aligns himself with the tradition of critical philosophy see FS 169-173, GSO 1-39, PT 41-82, EW2 459).

The scholarship agrees that there is a prima facie incompatibility in Foucault’s treatment of Kant, but there is disagreement about whether it is more substantial.  Jürgen Habermas (1986) maintains that Foucault’s alleged critique of the Kantian self-constituting subject cannot be squared with the conception of the self-constituting subject that emerges in his ethical writings.  Allen (2003) disputes this view, maintaining that Foucault never rejects the notion of self-constitution, but rather rejects the uniquely modern conception of self-constitution as it appears in Kantian and post-Kantian philosophy.  A possible alternative is presented by Norris (1994), who claims that Foucault simply does not have a consistent position on the Kantian philosophy, but that need not necessarily diminish our appreciation of his later work.  (It is relevant to this discussion that Foucault himself says he is not above changing his mind.  See AK 17, where Foucault famously responds to critics about his perceived shiftiness by asserting his right to change his mind, which is echoed later in his life at UP 8-9.  See also EW1 177, 225, and FL 465, where admits to changing his views about power and other concepts.)

b. Critique and Parrhesia

The recent publication of Foucault’s lecture courses on parrhesia provide further material for his connection to the critical tradition.  In his conclusion to his lectures at Berkeley on parrhesia Foucault very clearly connects parrhesia to the Kantian tradition of critical philosophy.  He invokes again the distinction between two traditions of philosophy:  the analytics of truth and the critical tradition.  Instead of explaining the former as being merely Cartesian and Kantian, he explains it as a concern with the correct processes of reasoning in determining whether a statement is true (thus, Descartes and Kant exemplify a certain kind of analytics of truth, namely, that which grounds truth in the subject).  On the other side is the critical tradition that is concerned with why it is important to tell the truth and who is entitled to speak it.  He then goes on to say that the seminar on parrhesia is a part of his “genealogy of the critical attitude in Western philosophy” (FS 170), thus aligning parrhesia with Kantian critical philosophy.  In doing so Foucault establishes that his critical philosophy is a practice of parrhesia in a similar manner to the Kantian practice of parrhesia.  In “What is Enlightenment?” Kant engages in parrhesia when he encourages his contemporaries to use their own reason, consistent with universal law, of course, and refuse to merely rely on the authority of others, including the authority of the monarchy and state, as a guide to their use of reason (however, one must privately obey institutional authorities while publicly expressing one’s disagreement with them).  Foucault understands his own critical activity as a form of parrhesia in a sense similar to that which Kant exemplifies in the essay on enlightenment.  Disclosing the historicity and arbitrariness of the previously unquestioned constraints that we impose on ourselves is, Foucault thinks, a parrhesiastic act.  Determining their precise relations is at the heart of interpreting the nature and scope of Foucault’s critical project.  For more, see Flynn 1987, O’Leary 2002, McGushin 2007, and the ensuing subsection.

c. Parrhesia and Self-Legislation


Ethics, Foucault says, is the form that freedom takes when it is informed by reflection, and by this he means that freedom consists in reflectively informed ascetic practices or practices of self.  These informed practices are imbued with an attitude, ethos, or relationship to one’s ethical substance that Foucault understands as the activity of freedom (EW1 284).  One reason that he focused on ethical work, then, is to discover how human beings freely make themselves into moral subjects of their own conduct through techniques or practices of self-restraint and self-discipline.

In The Government of Self and Others Foucault construes parrhesia as free practice of self par excellence.  “Parrēsia,” Foucault says, “is the free courage by which one binds oneself in the act of telling the truth.  Or again, parrhesia is the ethics of truth-telling as an action which is risky and free” (GSO 66).  The language that Foucault uses to describe parrhesiastic freedom throughout this lecture hour is incredibly suggestive of its source:  it is the language of Kantian self-legislation.  For Kant, autonomy does not consist in giving oneself the moral law, since the moral law is a necessity of the rational will; rather, autonomy consists in binding oneself to the law by freely conforming one’s conduct to it (see, for example, Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals 4:31).  This connection suggests that Foucault understands parrhesia as the supreme act of self-legislation and autonomy, where truth rather than moral law plays the normative role  – a point already suggested in Foucault’s claims about the original meaning of the care of the self.  That is to say, it seems that the truth is for Foucault a moral value or a good one ought to pursue.  Parrhesia is the supreme act of self-legislation because the risk and danger involved in the act tests one’s self-discipline and courage in their commitment to the truth.


This casts more light on Foucault’s representation of his project as critical.  Because autonomy is conceived as binding oneself to the truth, truth becomes the practical goal of Foucaultian critique.  This would entail that one is to pursue the truth in both its propositional and non-propositional (or existential forms) as the highest practice of self.

d. The Problem of Normativity and the Aesthetics of Existence

The chief objection to Foucault’s self-alignment with the critical tradition is not focused on his reading of Kant, but whether he has the philosophical resources to support a properly critical philosophy.  When Kant engages in parrhesia by exhorting his peers to use their own reason he is not issuing merely an exhortation, but, per his moral philosophy, he is telling them that their own practical reason obligates the use of reason consistent with universal law.  In this regard, Kant’s parrhesia flows from, and his use of critique is grounded in, his analytics of truth.  But Foucault intentionally steers clear of that project, which raises questions about the legitimacy and force of his critical philosophy.  Now, while criticisms of Foucault’s philosophy are diverse (see especially Taylor 1986, Habermas 1986, Bernstein 1994, and Fraser 1994), a common complaint is that he owes his readers some explanation for why one ought to accept his evaluations of modern ethics.

But it is not at all obvious that Foucaultian critical philosophy is – despite the use of the term ‘critique’ – in the business of evaluation.  It is true, as Bernstein (1994) points out, that Foucault very often uses a value-laden rhetoric.  However, it is also true that his project is critical in the peculiar sense of the unmasking of some previously concealed practice or aspect of some practice as an activity of frank-speech.  His rhetoric is therefore charged not because he has some hidden normative criteria already in hand (as Habermas 1990 alleges), but because, for example, certain individuals operate in a practice (say, penitential practices) under false opinions about its supposed noble goals (for example, defending society).  To this end Foucault need only unmask the tensions and inconsistencies in a practice through his historical labors to make his project critical.

While such a maneuver is consistent with a purely descriptive interpretation of Foucault’s critical philosophy, there is a palpable sense in which he goes beyond mere unmasking to recommendation.  For example, in an interview from 1984, “An Aesthetics of Existence,” Foucault states that moral approval (or mode of subjection) conceived merely as obedience to a moral code is not only disappearing but has disappeared, and “to this absence of morality corresponds, must correspond, the search for an aesthetics of existence” (PPC 49; see also OT 326-7).  On the one hand, this appears to be a descriptive, historical statement of a matter of fact, namely, that the nature of moral approval has changed.  On the other hand, some commentators (O’Leary 2002) interpret such statements as evaluations of modern ethics and recommendations for an alternative standard of moral approval exemplified by an aesthetics of existence.  There is no doubt that Foucault commends those who might undertake an aesthetics or arts of existence (EW1 261), or those who voluntarily and rigorously elaborate their existence according to a set of self-imposed standards that aim at what they take to be the good, fine, and beautiful life.  It is unclear, however, if Foucault is merely commending or also recommending an aesthetics of existence.  Foucault’s critics see no binding or authoritative reason why one ought to pursue an aesthetics of existence instead of, say, egoism unless one has the resources for sorting out good, fine, and beautiful things.  For this reason, critics (see Thacker 1993 in addition to those noted above) who interpret Foucault as recommending the aesthetics of existence find it to be an insufficiently articulated alternative to the alleged decline of modern morality.

Additionally, some criticism of Foucault’s ethical thought is based on a reading that empties the aesthetics of existence of its robust moral content.  While Foucault does not always help himself out in playing up that content (see EW1 261), it is worth paying attention to the fact that an aesthetics of existence heeds the ancient injunction to care for oneself.  This means it is ethically oriented by the care of the self and truth, such that one ought to fashion oneself in accordance with the life that one could reasonably maintain is truly fine and beautiful, and also that the practitioner of an aesthetics of existence demands of others, as he or she demands of himself or herself, that they provide a rational discourse for the life that they believe to be truly fine and beautiful.  So, while Foucault is careful to say that a return to ancient Greek ethics – a male-oriented, class-centered ethics – is neither a solution to contemporary moral problems nor a remedy to the alleged decline of modern morality – and indeed expresses pessimism about its prospects (HS 251-2) – an aesthetics of existence properly reformulated to modernity might prove worthy of consideration as a mode of subjection. In the end, however, Foucault supplies only interesting suggestions and nothing too concrete.  For this reason this area of Foucault’s thought, and its critical scope, remains hotly debated and a fruitful area of research.  For a wide range of essays dealing with the manifold of issues related to ethics and critical philosophy in Foucault’s thought, see Norris 1994, Kelly ed. 1994, Ashenden and Owen ed. 1999, O’Leary 2002, and McGushin 2007.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources and Abbreviations

  • Foucault, Michel.  The Order of Things:  An Archaeology of the Human Sciences.  New York: Vintage Books, 1970 (OT).
    • Chapters 7 and 9 are important for Foucault’s interpretation of modernity, including modern morality, and especially for his much discussed interpretation of Kant’s critical philosophy.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Archaeology of Knowledge and The Discourse on Language, trans. A. M. Sheridan Smith. New York: Pantheon Books, 1972 (AK).
    • Foucault lays out the structure of his archaeological method in both texts.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Birth of the Clinic:  An Archaeology of Medical Perception, trans. A. M. Sheridan Smith.  New York:  Vintage Books, 1973 (BC).
    • Foucault examines the genesis of modern medical perception and experience, which he characterizes in the Preface as both historical and critical.
  • Foucault, Michel.  Discipline and Punish:  The Birth of the Prison, trans. Alan Sheridan. New York: Vintage Books, 1977 (DP).
    • This book is primarily about modern penitential practices, which Foucault understands as one of the most important practices to develop, not coincidentally, at the same time as reform and liberation discourses.
  • Foucault, Michel.  Power/Knowledge:  Selected Interviews and Other Writings, 1972-1977, ed. Colin Gordon. New York: Pantheon Books, 1980 (PK).
    • This volume contains some of Foucault’s most controversial claims about the interrelations of power of knowledge and the nature of truth – claims that might be helpfully interpreted in light of his turn to ethics.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The History of Sexuality, vol. 3: The Care of the Self, trans. Robert Hurley. New York: Vintage Books, 1988 (CS).
    • Part Two, “The Cultivation of the Self,” gives an outline of Roman ethics.  The rest of the text explores changes in ancient Roman ethics and the intensification of the problematization of the aphrodisia, focusing on increased austerity in bodily health, marriage, and the love of boys.
  • Foucault, Michel.  Philosophy, Politics, Culture:  Interviews and Other Writings of Michel Foucault, ed. Lawrence D. Kritzman.  New York:  Routledge, 1988 (PPC).
    • A collection of writings and interviews.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The History of Sexuality, vol. 2: The Use of Pleasure, trans. Robert Hurley. New York: Vintage Books, 1990 (UP).
    • Chapter Three of the Introduction is the most lucid presentation of his theory of ethics.  Chapter One is also noteworthy because it offers some insight into Foucault’s critical-historical project.
  • Foucault, Michel.  Foucault Live (Interviews, 1961-1984), ed. Sylvère Lotringer.  New York: Semiotext(e), 1996 (FL).
    • A collection of interviews spanning Foucault’s career.  Some of the early interviews in this volume contain some of Foucault’s strongest critical rhetoric about the subject.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Essential Works of Michel Foucault, vol. 1:  Ethics:  Subjectivity and Truth, ed. Paul Rabinow.  New York:  The New Press, 1997 (EW1).
    • Items of special note in this volume are “On the Genealogy of Ethics:  An Overview of Work in Progress” (253-280), “The Ethics of the Concern for Self as a Practice of Freedom” (281-302), and “What is Enlightenment?” (303-320).
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Essential Works of Michel Foucault, vol. 2: Aesthetics, Method, and Epistemology, ed. James D. Faubion. New York: The New Press, 1998 (EW2).
    • The essay, “Foucault,” penned in part pseudonymously by Foucault himself, is worth mentioning because he provides an overview of his work in addition to straightforward statements about his affiliation with the Kantian tradition of critical philosophy.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Essential Works of Michel Foucault, vol. 3:  Power, ed. James Faubion.  New York:  The New Press, 2000 (EW3).
    • The essay “The Subject and Power” is perhaps Foucault’s clearest presentation of his view on power-relations and it is relevant to those interested in his ethics.
  • Foucault, Michel.  Fearless Speech, ed. Joseph Pearson.  Los Angeles:  Semiotext(e), 2001 (FS).
    • Foucault covers political parrhesia in the writings of Euripides, Platonic texts on Socratic and philosophical parrhesia, and parrhesia in the Epicureans and Cynics.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Hermeneutics of the Subject:  Lectures at the Collège de France 1981-1982, trans. Graham Burchell.  New York:  Palgrave MacMillan, 2005 (HS).
    • This lecture course, especially the very first lecture, is crucial to the development of Foucault’s conception of ethics and his understanding of the history of ethics.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Politics of Truth, ed. Sylvère Lotringer. Los Angeles: Semiotext(e), 2007 (PT).
    • This volume contains the important 1978 address, “What is Critique?”, which is the first indication of Foucault’s shift of focus from power to ethics, although it is not clearly articulated as such.  It is also noteworthy because it is Foucault’s first extended discussion of Kant’s essay “What is Enlightenment?”
  • Foucault, Michel.  Introduction to Kant’s Anthropology, trans. Roberto Nigro and Kate Biggs.  Los Angeles:  Semiotext(e), 2008.
    • Through a reading of Kant’s Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View and its contextualization with the critical philosophy, Foucault suggests that Kantian philosophical anthropology is at the very heart of the critical philosophy.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Government of Self and Others:  Lectures at the Collège de France 1982-1983, trans. Graham Burchell.  New York:  Palgrave MacMillan, 2010 (GSO).
    • Foucault narrows his focus from the care of the self to parrhesia as a practice of caring for the self.  Foucault devotes the first two hours to discussing primarily Kant’s essay “What is Enlightenment?” but also his discussion of revolution in The Conflict of the Faculties.
  • Foucault, Michel.  The Courage of Truth:  Lectures at the Collège de France 1983-1984, trans. Graham Burchell.  New York:  Palgrave MacMillan, 2011.
    • Parrhesia is once again the focus of this lecture course.

b. Select Secondary Sources

  • Allen, Amy. “Foucault and Enlightenment: A Critical Reappraisal,” Constellations 10:2, 2003, pp. 180-198.
    • Allen contends that Foucault is engaged in a critique of Kantian critique in which Foucault is said to claim that Kant designs his critical philosophy around the confused doctrine of the subject.
  • Ashenden, Samantha and David Owens, ed. Foucault Contra Habermas:  Recasting the Dialogue Between Genealogy and Critical Theory.  Thousand Oaks:  SAGE Publications, Inc., 1999.
    • A collection of essays on Foucault’s engagement with Habermas.
  • Bernstein, Richard. “Foucault: Critique as a Philosophical Ethos,” Critique and Power: Recasting the Foucault/Habermas Debate, ed. Michael Kelly, pp. 211-42. Cambridge: The MIT Press, 1994.
    • Not only does Bernstein do an excellent job summarizing the complaints of critics such as Habermas and Fraser, he offers some insightful worries about Foucault’s self-alignment with the critical tradition.
  • Davidson, Arnold I.  “Archaeology, Genealogy, Ethics,” Foucault:  A Critical Reader, ed. David Couzens Hoy, pp. 221-33.  Oxford:  Blackwell Publishers, 1986.
    • Davidson provides a helpful overview of Foucault’s conception of ethics and situation of that conception within his archaeological and genealogical methods.
  • Davidson, Arnold I.  “Ethics as Ascetics:  Foucault, the History of Ethics, and Ancient Thought,” The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, 2nd Edition, ed. Gary Gutting, pp. 123-148.  Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press, 2005.
    • Yet another insightful treatment by Davidson of Foucault’s conception of ethics with discussion of the latter’s analysis of ancient sexuality.
  • Detel, Wolfgang.  Foucault and Classical Antiquity: Power, Ethics and Knowledge, trans. David Wigg-Wolf.  Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press, 2005.
    • A critical treatment of Foucault’s investigations of ancient ethics, including original discussion of ancient ethics, and his historical methodology.
  • Flynn, Thomas.  “Foucault as Parrhēsiast:  His Last Course at the Collège de France (1984),” The Final Foucault, ed. James Bernauer and David Rasmussen, pp. 102-18.  Cambridge:  The MIT Press, 1988.
    • A summary and clarification of Foucault’s last lecture course, The Courage of Truth, that connects it to his views about and attitude towards the enlightenment, and, given the suggested connections, how to read Foucault as a parrhēsiast.
  • Fraser, Nancy.  “Michel Foucault:  A ‘Young Conservative’?”, Critique and Power: Recasting the Foucault/Habermas Debate, ed. Michael Kelly, pp. 185-210. Cambridge: The MIT Press, 1994.
    • Fraser provides a helpful discussion and commentary on Habermas’ criticisms of Foucault.
  • Habermas, Jürgen.  “Taking Aim at the Heart of the Present,” Foucault:  A Critical Reader, ed. David Couzens Hoy, pp. 103-8.  Cambridge:  Blackwell Publishers Inc., 1986.
    • Habermas maintains that not only does Foucault have an incompatible interpretation of Kant’s critical philosophy, but that he is also not entitled to engage in critical philosophy because he rejects the normative requirements of critique.
  • Habermas, Jürgen.  The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity:  Twelve Lectures, trans. Frederick G. Lawrence.  Cambridge:  The MIT Press, 1990.
    • Habermas mounts a powerful critique of Foucault’s entire thought in two lengthy chapters (Chapters Nine and Ten).
  • Han, Béatrice.  Foucault’s Critical Project:  Between the Transcendental and the Historical, trans. Edward Pile.  Stanford:  Stanford University Press, 2002.
    • Han maintains that Foucault argues that Kant is unable to maintain the distinction between the transcendental and the empirical; however, she contends that Foucault himself is unable to maintain the distinction throughout his work between the transcendental and the historical.
  • Kelly, Michael, ed.  Critique and Power: Recasting the Foucault/Habermas Debate.  Cambridge:  The MIT Press.
    • This volume includes writings by both Foucault and Habermas in addition to essays dealing with value-related issues in both Foucault’s thought and Habermas’.
  • Levy, Neil.  “Foucault as Virtue Ethicist,” Foucault Studies, no. 1, 2004, pp. 20-31.
    • The author maintains that Foucault’s investigations of the care of the self show that his ethical work is best understood as a virtue theoretic ethics.
  • McGushin, Edward F.  Foucault’s Askēsis:  An Introduction to the Philosophical Life.  Evanston:  Northwestern University Press, 2007.
    • McGushin weaves together the various threads of Foucault’s thought as a spiritual practice that is exercised in the criticism of the Cartesian moment and the confluence of normalizing biopolitics.
  • Milchman, Alan and Alan Rosenberg.  “The Aesthetic and Ascetic Dimensions of an Ethics of Self-Fashioning:  Nietzsche and Foucault,” Parrhesia:  A Journal of Critical Philosophy, no. 2, 2007, pp. 44-65.
    • This essay provides a valuable discussion of Foucault’s ‘ethical turn’ and his concept of an aesthetics of existence, including how it is related to a similar view found in the philosophy of Friedrich Nietzsche, a well-known influence on Foucault.
  • Norris, Christopher.  “‘What is Enlightenment?’  Kant according to Foucault,” The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, 1st Edition, ed. Gary Gutting, pp. 159-96.  Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press, 1994.
    • Norris considers the complexity of Foucault’s conception of the subject as it appears throughout the latter’s writings and in the context of his relationship to Kant.
  • O’Leary, Timothy.  Foucault and the Art of Ethics.  London:  Continuum, 2002.
    • O’Leary lays out an account of Foucault’s ethics in which Foucault offers an aesthetics of existence as an alternative to the failure of modern theory to ground moral obligations.  Without denying potential problems in this ethics, O’Leary maintains that its goal is self-transformation and experimentation.
  • Schmidt, James and Thomas Wartenberg, “Foucault’s Enlightenment: Critique, Revolution, and the Fashioning of the Self,” Critique and Power: Recasting the Foucault/Habermas Debate, ed. Michael Kelly, pp. 283-314. Cambridge: The MIT Press, 1994.
    • The authors consider Foucault’s reading of Kant and the former’s relationship to the enlightenment, concluding that, while Foucault is not immune from criticism, critics of his work might start with the Kantian ideas that Foucault inherits.
  • Sharpe, Matthew.  “‘Critique’ as Technology of the Self,” Foucault Studies, no. 2, 2005, pp. 97-116.
    • Sharpe posits that there is a theoretical continuity in Foucault’s thought (that is, there is no ‘ethical turn’) insofar as Foucault always maintained the value of Kantian critique as a practice of self.
  • Stone, Brad E.  “Subjectivity and Truth,” Foucault:  Key Concepts, Dianna Taylor ed., pp. 143-57.  Durham:  Acumen, 2011.
    • The care of the self and its relation to parrhēsia is covered, in addition to exploring possibilities of caring for the self in the modern age.
  • Taylor, Charles.  “Foucault on Freedom and Truth,” Foucault:  A Critical Reader, ed. David Couzens Hoy, pp. 69-102.  Cambridge:  Blackwell Publishers Inc., 1986.
    • Taylor argues that Foucault's conception of power-relations assumes views of both truth and freedom that the latter rejects.
  • Taylor, Dianna.  “Normalization and Normativity,” Foucault Studies, no. 7, 2009, pp. 45-63.
    • Taylor deals with the issue of normativity in both Foucault and Habermas, maintaining that Habermas’ conception of normativity might in practice constrain (viz. normalization) rather than emancipate.
  • Taylor, Dianna.  “Practices of the Self,” Foucault:  Key Concepts, Dianna Taylor ed., pp. 173-86.  Durham:  Acumen, 2011.
    • Taylor examines Foucault’s notion of practices of the self in the context of the Christian practice of self-sacrifice, which she contrasts with his own critical practice that, she claims, emphasizes innovative and creative practices of the self.
  • Thacker, Andrew.  “Foucault’s Aesthetics of Existence,” Radical Philosophy, no. 63, 1993, pp. 13-21.
    • Foucault’s notion of an aesthetics of existence is treated, and Thacker maintains that said notion is insufficiently articulated to stand as a criteria for personal decision-making.


Author Information

Bob Robinson
Loyola Marymount University
U. S. A.

Frantz Fanon (1925-1961)

FrantzfanonpjwproductionsFrantz Fanon was one of a few extraordinary thinkers supporting the decolonization struggles occurring after World War II, and he remains among the most widely read and influential of these voices.  His brief life was notable both for his whole-hearted engagement in the independence struggle the Algerian people waged against France and for his astute, passionate analyses of the human impulse towards freedom in the colonial context.  His written works have become central texts in Africana thought, in large part because of their attention to the roles hybridity and creolization can play in forming humanist, anti-colonial cultures.  Hybridity, in particular, is seen as a counter-hegemonic opposition to colonial practices, a non-assimilationist way of building connections across cultures that Africana scholar Paget Henry argues is constitutive of Africana political philosophy.

Tracing the development of his writings helps explain how and why he has become an inspirational figure firing the moral imagination of people who continue to work for social justice for the marginalized and the oppressed.  Fanon’s first work Peau Noire, Masques Blancs (Black Skin, White Masks) was his first effort to articulate a radical anti-racist humanism that adhered neither to assimilation to a white-supremacist mainstream nor to reactionary philosophies of black superiority.  While the attention to oppression of colonized peoples that was to dominate his later works was present in this first book, its call for a new understanding of humanity was undertaken from the subject-position of a relatively privileged Martinican citizen of France, in search of his own place in the world as a black man from the French Caribbean, living in France.  His later works, notably L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne (A Dying Colonialism) and the much more well-known Les Damnés de la Terre (The Wretched of the Earth), go beyond a preoccupation with Europe’s pretensions to being a universal standard of culture and civilization, in order to take on the struggles and take up the consciousness of the colonized “natives” as they rise up and reclaim simultaneously their lands and their human dignity.  It is Fanon’s expansive conception of humanity and his decision to craft the moral core of decolonization theory as a commitment to the individual human dignity of each member of populations typically dismissed as “the masses” that stands as his enduring legacy.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Africana Phenomenology
  3. Decolonization Theory
  4. Influences on Fanon’s Thought
  5. Movements and Thinkers Influenced by Fanon
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Frantz Fanon was born in the French colony of Martinique on July 20, 1925.  His family occupied a social position within Martinican society that could reasonably qualify them as part of the black bourgeoisie; Frantz’s father, Casimir Fanon, was a customs inspector and his mother, Eléanore Médélice, owned a hardware store in downtown Fort-de-France, the capital of Martinique.  Members of this social stratum tended to strive for assimilation, and identification, with white French culture.  Fanon was raised in this environment, learning France’s history as his own, until his high school years when he first encountered the philosophy of negritude, taught to him by Aimé Césaire, Martinique’s other renowned critic of European colonization.  Politicized, and torn between the assimilationism of Martinique’s middle class and the preoccupation with racial identity that negritude promotes, Fanon left the colony in 1943, at the age of 18, to fight with the Free French forces in the waning days of World War II.

After the war, he stayed in France to study psychiatry and medicine at university in Lyons.  Here, he encountered bafflingly simplistic anti-black racism—so different from the complex, class-permeated distinctions of shades of lightness and darkness one finds in the Caribbean—which would so enrage him that he was inspired to write “An Essay for the Disalienation of Blacks,” the piece of writing that would eventually become Peau Noire, Masques Blancs (1952).  It was here too that he began to explore the Marxist and existentialist ideas that would inform the radical departure from the assimilation-negritude dichotomy that Peau Noire’s anti-racist humanism inaugurates.

Although he briefly returned to the Caribbean after he finished his studies, he no longer felt at home there and in 1953, after a stint in Paris, he accepted a position as chef de service (chief of staff) for the psychiatric ward of the Blida-Joinville hospital in Algeria.  The following year, 1954, marked the eruption of the Algerian war of independence against France, an uprising directed by the Front de Libération Nationale (FLN) and brutally repressed by French armed forces.  Working in a French hospital, Fanon was increasingly responsible for treating both the psychological distress of the soldiers and officers of the French army who carried out torture in order to suppress anti-colonial resistance and the trauma suffered by the Algerian torture victims.  Already alienated by the homogenizing effects of French imperialism, by 1956 Fanon realized he could not continue to aid French efforts to put down a decolonization movement that commanded his political loyalties, and he resigned his position at the hospital.

Once he was no longer officially working for the French government in Algeria, Fanon was free to devote himself to the cause of Algerian independence.  During this period, he was based primarily in Tunisia where he trained nurses for the FLN, edited its newspaper el Moujahid, and contributed articles about the movement to sympathetic publications, including Presence Africaine and Jean-Paul Sartre’s journal Les Temps Modernes.  Some of Fanon’s writings from this period were published posthumously in 1964 as Pour la Révolution Africaine (Toward the African Revolution).  In 1959 Fanon published a series of essays, L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne, (The Year of the Algerian Revolution) which detail how the oppressed natives of Algeria organized themselves into a revolutionary fighting force.  That same year, he took up a diplomatic post in the provisional Algerian government, ambassador to Ghana, and used the influence of this position to help open up supply routes for the Algerian army.  It was in Ghana that Fanon was diagnosed with the leukemia that would be his cause of death.  Despite his rapidly failing health, Fanon spent ten months of his last year of life writing the book for which he would be most remembered, Les Damnés de la Terre, an indictment of the violence and savagery of colonialism which he ends with a passionate call for a new history of humanity to be initiated by a decolonized Third World.  In October 1961, Fanon was brought to the United States by a C.I.A. agent so that he could receive treatment at a National Institutes of Health facility in Bethesda, Maryland.  He died two months later, on December 6, 1961, reportedly still preoccupied with the cause of liberty and justice for the peoples of the Third World. At the request of the FLN, his body was returned to Tunisia, where it was subsequently transported across the border and buried in the soil of the Algerian nation for which he fought so single-mindedly during the last five years of his life.

2. Africana Phenomenology

Fanon’s contribution to phenomenology, glossed as a critical race discourse (an analysis of the pre-conscious forces shaping the self that organizes itself around race as a founding category), most particularly his exploration of the existential challenges faced by black human beings in a social world that is constituted for white human beings, receives its most explicit treatment in Peau Noire, Masques Blancs.  The central metaphor of this book, that black people must wear “white masks” in order to get by in a white world, is reminiscent of W.E.B. Du Bois’ argument that African Americans develop a double consciousness living under a white power structure: one that flatters that structure (or some such) and one experienced when among other African Americans.  Fanon’s treatment of the ways black people respond to a social context that racializes them at the expense of our shared humanity ranges across a broader range of cultures than Du Bois, however; Fanon examines how race shapes (deforms) the lives of both men and women in the French Caribbean, in France, and in colonial conflicts in Africa.  Africana sociologist Paget Henry characterizes Fanon’s relation to Du Bois in the realm of phenomenology as one of extension and of clarification, since he offers a more detailed investigation of how the self encounters the trauma of being categorized by others as inferior due to an imposed racial identity and how that self can recuperate a sense of identity and a cultural affiliation that is independent of the racist project of an imperializing dominant culture.

Fanon dissects in all of his major works the racist and colonizing project of white European culture, that is, the totalizing, hierarchical worldview that needs to set up the black human being as “negro” so it has an “other” against which to define itself.  While Peau Noire offers a sustained discussion of the psychological dimensions of this “negrification” of human beings and possibilities of resistance to it, the political dimensions are explored in L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne and Les Damnés de la Terre.  Fanon’s diagnosis of the psychological dimensions of negrification’s phenomenological violence documents its traumatizing effects: first, negrification promotes negative attitudes toward other blacks and Africa; second, it normalizes attitudes of desire and debasement toward Europe, white people, and white culture in general; and finally, it presents itself as such an all-encompassing way of being in the world that no other alternative appears to be possible.  The difficulty of overcoming the sense of alienation that negrification sets up as necessary for the black human being lies in learning to see oneself not just as envisioned and valued (that is, devalued) by the white dominant culture but simultaneously through a perspective constructed both in opposition to and independently from the racist/racialized mainstream, a parallel perspective in which a black man or woman’s value judgments—of oneself and of others of one’s race—do not have to be filtered through white norms and values.  It is only through development of this latter perspective that the black man or woman can shake off the psychological colonization that racist phenomenology imposes, Fanon argues.

One of the most pervasive agents of phenomenological conditioning is language.  In Peau Noire, Fanon analyzes language as that which carries and reveals racism in culture, using as an example the symbolism of whiteness and blackness in the French language—a point that translates equally well into English linguistic habits.  One cannot learn and speak this language, Fanon asserts, without subconsciously accepting the cultural meanings embedded in equations of purity with whiteness and malevolence with blackness: to be white is to be good, and to be black is to be bad.  While Peau Noire focuses on the colonizing aspects of the French language, L’An Cinq, on the other hand, offers an interesting account of how language might enable decolonization efforts.  Fanon describes a decision made by the revolutionary forces in Algeria in 1956 to give up their previous boycott of French and instead start using it as the lingua franca that could unite diverse communities of resistance, including those who did not speak Arabic.  The subversive effects of adopting French extended beyond the convenience of a common language; it also cast doubt on the simplistic assumption the French colonizers had been making, namely, that all French speakers in Algeria were loyal to the colonial government.  After strategically adopting the colonizer’s language, one entered a shop or a government office no longer necessarily announcing one’s politics in one’s choice of language.

Fanon’s critical race phenomenology is not without its critics, many of whom read Peau Noire’s back-to-back accounts of the black woman’s desire for a white lover and the black man’s desire for a white lover as misogynistic.  According to these critiques, typically offered from a feminist point of view, the autobiography of Mayotte Capécia, a Martinican woman who seeks the love of a white man, any white man it seems, is treated by Fanon (who describes it as “cut-rate” and “ridiculous”) with far less respect than the novel by René Maran, which describes the story of Jean Veneuse, a black man who reluctantly falls in love with a white Frenchwoman and hesitates to marry her until he is urged to do so by her brother.  Although Fanon is unequivocal in his statement that both of these discussions serve as examples of “alienated psyches,” white feminists who make this charge of misogyny point to his less sympathetic account of Capécia as evidence that he holds black women complicit in the devaluing of blackness.  Where it is found at all in the work of black feminist writers, this allegation tends to be more tentative, and tends to be contextualized within a pluralist inventory of phenomenological approaches.  Just as Fanon selects race as the founding category of phenomenology, a feminist phenomenology would focus on gender as a founding category.  In this pluralist framework, Fanon’s attention to race at the expense of gender is arguably more explicable as a methodological choice than a deep-seated contempt for women.

3. Decolonization Theory

The political dimensions of negrification that call for decolonization receive fuller treatment in L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne and Les Damnés de la Terre.  But Fanon does not simply diagnose the political symptoms of the worldview within which black men and women are dehumanized.  He situates his diagnosis within an unambiguous ethical commitment to the equal right of every human being to have his or her human dignity recognized by others.  This assertion, that all of us are entitled to moral consideration and that no one is dispensable, is the principled core of his decolonization theory, which continues to inspire scholars and activists dedicated to human rights and social justice.

As the French title suggests, L’An Cinq (published in English as A Dying Colonialism) is Fanon’s first-hand account of how the Algerian people mobilized themselves into a revolutionary fighting force and repelled the French colonial government.  The lessons that other aspiring revolutionary movements can learn from Fanon’s presentation of the FLN’s strategies and tactics are embedded in their particular Algerian context, but nonetheless evidently adaptable.  In addition to describing the FLN’s strategic adoption of French as the language of communication with its sympathetic civilian population, Fanon also traces the interplay of ideological and pragmatic choices they made about communications technology.  Once the French started suppressing newspapers, the FLN had to rethink their standing boycott of radios, which they had previously denounced as the colonizer’s technology.  This led to the creation of a nationalist radio station, the Voice of Fighting Algeria, that now challenged colonial propaganda with what Fanon described as “the first words of the nation.”  Another of the fundamental challenges they issued to the colonial world of division and hierarchy was the radically inclusive statement the provisional government made that all people living in Algeria would be considered citizens of the new nation.  This was a bold contestation of European imperialism on the model of Haiti’s first constitution (1805), which attempted to break down hierarchies of social privilege based on skin color by declaring that all Haitian citizens would be considered black.  Both the Algerian and Haitian declarations are powerful decolonizing moves because they undermine the very Manichean structure that Fanon identifies as the foundation of the colonial world.

While L’An Cinq offers the kinds of insights one might hope for from a historical document, Les Damnés de la Terre is a more abstract analysis of colonialism and revolution.  It has been described as a handbook for black revolution.  The book ranges over the necessary role Fanon thinks violence must play in decolonization struggles, the false paths decolonizing nations take when they entrust their eventual freedom to negotiations between a native elite class and the formers colonizers instead of mobilizing the masses as a popular fighting force, the need to recreate a national culture through a revolutionary arts and literature movement, and an inventory of the psychiatric disorders that colonial repression unleashes.  Part of its shocking quality, from a philosophical perspective, is alluded to in the preface that Jean-Paul Sartre wrote for the book: it speaks the language of philosophy and deploys the kind of Marxist and Hegelian arguments one might expect in a philosophy of liberation, but it does not speak to the West.  It is Fanon conversing with, advising, his fellow Third-World revolutionaries.

The controversy that swirls around Les Damnés is very different from the one Peau Noire attracts.  Where feminist critiques of Peau Noire require a deep reading and an analysis of the kinds of questions Fanon failed to ask, those who find fault with Les Damnés for what they see as its endorsement of violent insurgency are often reading Fanon’s words too simplistically.   His argument is not that decolonizing natives are justified in using violent means to effect their ends;  the point he is making in his opening chapter, “Concerning Violence,” is that violence is a fundamental element of colonization, introduced by the colonizers and visited upon the colonized as part of the colonial oppression.  The choice concerning violence that the colonized native must make, in Fanon’s view, is between continuing to accept it—absorbing the abuse or displacing it upon other members of the oppressed native community—or taking this foreign violence and throwing it back in the face of those who initiated it.  Fanon’s consistent existentialist commitment to choosing one’s character through one’s actions means that decolonization can only happen when the native takes up his or her responsible subjecthood and refuses to occupy the position of violence-absorbing passive victim.

4. Influences on Fanon’s Thought

The first significant influence on Fanon was the philosophy of negritude to which he was introduced by Aimé Césaire.  Although this philosophy of black pride was a potent counterbalance to the assimilation tendencies into which Fanon had been socialized, it was ultimately an inadequate response to an imperializing culture that presents itself as a universal worldview.  Far more fruitful, in Fanon’s view, were his studies in France of Hegel, Marx, and Husserl.  From these sources he developed the view that dialectic could be the process through which the othered/alienated self can respond to racist trauma in a healthy way, a sensitivity to the social and economic forces that shape human beings, and an appreciation for the pre-conscious construction of self that phenomenology can reveal.  He also found Sartre’s existentialism a helpful resource for theorizing the process of self construction by which each of us chooses to become the persons we are.  This relation with Sartre appears to have been particularly mutually beneficial; Sartre’s existentialism permeates Peau Noire and in turn, Sartre’s heartfelt and radical commitment to decolonization suggests that Fanon had quite an influence on him.

5. Movements and Thinkers Influenced by Fanon

The pan-Africanism that Fanon understood himself to be contributing to in his work on behalf of Third World peoples never really materialized as a political movement.  It must be remembered that in Fanon’s day, the term “Third World” did not have the meaning it has today.  Where today it designates a collection of desperately poor countries that are the objects of the developed world’s charity, in the 1950s and 1960s, the term indicated the hope of an emerging alternative to political alliance with either the First World (the United States and Europe) or the Second World (the Soviet bloc).  The attempt to generate political solidarity and meaningful political power among the newly independent nations of Africa instead foundered as these former colonies fell victim to precisely the sort of false decolonization and client-statism that Fanon had warned against.  Today, as a political program, that ideal of small-state solidarity survives only in the leftist critiques of neoliberalism offered by activists like Noam Chomsky and Naomi Klein.

Instead, the discourse of solidarity and political reconstruction has retreated into the academy, where it is theorized as “postcolonialism.”  Here we find the critical theorizing of scholars like Edward Said and Gayatri Spivak, both of whom construct analyses of the colonial Self and the colonized Other that, implicitly at least, depend on the Manichean division that Fanon presents in Les Damnés.

Thinkers around the globe have been profoundly influenced by Fanon’s work on anti-black racism and decolonization theory.  Brazilian theorist of critical pedagogy Paulo Freire engages Fanon in dialogue in Pedagogy of the Oppressed, notably in his discussion of the mis-steps that oppressed people may make on their path to liberation.  Freire’s emphasis on the need to go beyond a mere turning of the tables, a seizure of the privileges and social positions of the oppressors, echoes Fanon’s concern in Les Damnés and in essays such as “Racism and Culture” (in Pour la Révolution Africaine) that failure to appreciate the deeply Manichean structure of the settler-native division could lead to a false decolonization in which a native elite simply replace the settler elite as the oppressive rulers of the still exploited masses.  This shared concern is the motivation for Freire’s insistence on perspectival transformation and on populist inclusion as necessary conditions for social liberation.

Kenyan author and decolonization activist Ngũgĩ wa Thiong’o also draws on ideas Fanon presents in Les Damnés.  Inspired mainly by Fanon’s meditations on the need to decolonize national consciousness, Ngũgĩ has written of the need to get beyond the “colonization of the mind” that occurs in using the language of imposed powers.  Like Fanon, he recognizes that language has a dual character.  It colonizes in the sense that power congeals in the history of how language is used (that is, its role in carrying culture). But it can also be adapted to our real-life communication and our “image-forming” projects, which means it also always carries the potential to be the means by which we liberate ourselves.  Ngũgĩ’s last book in English, Decolonizing the Mind, was his official renunciation of the colonizer’s language in favor of his native tongue, Gĩkũyũ, and its account of the politics of language in African literature can fruitfully be read as an illustration of the abstract claims Fanon makes about art and culture in Les Damnés and Pour la Révolution Africaine.

Maori scholar Linda Tuhiwai Smith takes up Fanon’s call for artists and intellectuals of decolonizing societies to create new literatures and new cultures for their liberated nations.  Applying Fanon’s call to her own context, Tuhiwai Smith notes that Maori writers in New Zealand have begun to produce literature that reflects and supports a resurgent indigenous sovereignty movement, but she notes that there is little attention to achieving that same intellectual autonomy in the social sciences.  Inspired by Fanon’s call to voice, she has written Decolonizing Methodologies, a book that interrogates the way “research” has been used by European colonial powers to subjugate indigenous peoples and also lays out methodological principles for indigenous research agendas that will not reproduce the same dehumanizing results that colonial knowledge production has been responsible for

In the United States, Fanon’s influence continues to grow.  Feminist theorist bell hooks, one of those who notes the absence of attention to gender in Fanon’s work, nonetheless acknowledges the power of his vision of the resistant decolonized subject and the possibility of love that this vision nurtures.  Existential phenomenologist Lewis R. Gordon works to articulate the new humanism that Fanon identified as the goal of a decolonized anti-racist philosophy.  Gordon is one of the Africana--and Caribbean--focused scholars in American academia who has been involved in founding today’s most prominent Africana-Caribbean research network, the Caribbean Philosophical Association, which awards an annual book prize in Frantz Fanon’s name.  The Frantz Fanon Prize recognizes excellence in scholarship that advances Caribbean philosophy and Africana-humanist thought in the Fanonian tradition.

In Paris, the heart of the former empire that Fanon opposed so vigorously in his short life, his philosophy of humanist liberation and his commitment to the moral relevance of all people everywhere have been taken up by his daughter Mireille Fanon.  She heads the Fondation Frantz Fanon and follows in her father’s footsteps with her work on questions of international law and human rights, supporting the rights of migrants, and championing struggles against the impunity of the powerful and all forms of racism.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Fanon, Frantz.  L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne.  Paris: François Maspero, 1959.  [Published in English as A Dying Colonialism, trans. Haakon Chevalier (New York: Grove Press, 1965).]
  • Fanon, Frantz.  Les Damnés de la Terre.  Paris: François Maspero, 1961.  [Published in English as The Wretched of the Earth, trans. Constance Farrington (New York: Grove Press, 1965).]
  • Fanon, Frantz.  Peau Noire, Masques Blancs.  Paris: Editions du Seuil, 1952.  [Published in English as Black Skin, White Masks, trans. Charles Lam Markmann (New York: Grove Press, 1967).]
  • Fanon, Frantz.  Pour la Révolution Africaine.  Paris: François Maspero, 1964.  [Published in English as Toward the African Revolution, trans. Haakon Chevalier (New York: Grove Press, 1967).]

b. Secondary Sources

  • Cherki, Alice.  Frantz Fanon: A Portrait.  Trans. Nadia Benabid.  Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 2006.
    • A biography of Fanon by one of his co-workers at the Blida-Joinville hospital in Algeria and fellow activists for Algerian liberation.
  • Gibson, Nigel C.  Fanon: The Postcolonial Imagination.  Cambridge, UK: Polity Press, 2003.
    • An introduction to Fanon’s ideas with emphasis on the role that dialectic played in his development of a philosophy of liberation.
  • Gibson, Nigel C. (ed.).  Rethinking Fanon: The Continuing Dialogue.  Amherst, NY: Humanity Books, 1999.
    • A collection of some of the enduring essays on Fanon, with attention to his continuing relevance.
  • Gordon, Lewis R.  Fanon and the Crisis of European Man: An Essay on Philosophy and the Human Sciences.  New York: Routledge, 1995.
    • An argument in the Fanonian vein that bad faith in European practice of the human sciences has impeded the inclusive humanism Fanon called for.
  • Gordon, Lewis R., T. Denean Sharpley-Whiting, and Renée T. White (eds.).  Fanon: A Critical Reader.  Malden, MA: Blackwell, 1996.
    • Essays on Africana philosophy, neocolonial and postcolonial studies, human sciences, and other academic discourses that place Fanon’s work in its appropriate and illuminating contexts.
  • Hoppe, Elizabeth A. and Tracey Nicholls (eds.).  Fanon and the Decolonization of Philosophy.  Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2010.
    • Essays by contemporary Fanon scholars exploring the enduring relevance to philosophy of Fanon’s thought.
  • Sekyi-Out, Ato.  Fanon’s Dialectic of Experience.  Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1996.
    • A hermeneutic reading of all of Fanon’s texts as a single dialectical narrative.
  • Zahar, Renate.  Frantz Fanon: Colonialism and Alienation.  New York: Monthly Review Press, 1974.
    • An analysis of Fanon’s writings through the concept of alienation.


Author Information

Tracey Nicholls
Lewis University
U. S. A.


Existentialism is a catch-all term for those philosophers who consider the nature of the human condition as a key philosophical problem and who share the view that this problem is best addressed through ontology. This very broad definition will be clarified by discussing seven key themes that existentialist thinkers address. Those philosophers considered existentialists are mostly from the continent of Europe, and date from the 19th and 20th centuries. Outside philosophy, the existentialist movement is probably the most well-known philosophical movement, and at least two of its members are among the most famous philosophical personalities and widely read philosophical authors. It has certainly had considerable influence outside philosophy, for example on psychological theory and on the arts. Within philosophy, though, it is safe to say that this loose movement considered as a whole has not had a great impact, although individuals or ideas counted within it remain important. Moreover, most of the philosophers conventionally grouped under this heading either never used, or actively disavowed, the term 'existentialist'. Even Sartre himself once said: “Existentialism? I don’t know what that is.” So, there is a case to be made that the term – insofar as it leads us to ignore what is distinctive about philosophical positions and to conflate together significantly different ideas – does more harm than good.

In this article, however, it is assumed that something sensible can be said about existentialism as a loosely defined movement. The article has three sections. First, we outline a set of themes that define, albeit very broadly, existentialist concerns. This is done with reference to the historical context of existentialism, which will help us to understand why certain philosophical problems and methods were considered so important. Second, we discuss individually six philosophers who are arguably its central figures, stressing in these discussions the ways in which these philosophers approached existentialist themes in distinctive ways. These figures, and many of the others we mention, have full length articles of their own within the Encyclopedia. Finally, we look very briefly at the influence of existentialism, especially outside philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Key Themes of Existentialism
    1. Philosophy as a Way of Life
    2. Anxiety and Authenticity
    3. Freedom
    4. Situatedness
    5. Existence
    6. Irrationality/Absurdity
    7. The Crowd
  2. Key Existentialist Philosophers
    1. Søren Kierkegaard (1813-1855) as an Existentialist Philosopher
    2. Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900) as an Existentialist Philosopher
    3. Martin Heidegger (1889-1976) as an Existentialist Philosopher
    4. Jean-Paul Sartre (1905-1980) as an Existentialist Philosopher
    5. Simone de Beauvoir (1908-1986) as an Existentialist Philosopher
    6. Albert Camus (1913-1960) as an Existentialist Philosopher
  3. The Influence of Existentialism
    1. The Arts and Psychology
    2. Philosophy
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. General Introductions
    2. Anthologies
    3. Primary Bibliography
    4. Secondary Bibliography
    5. Other Works Cited

1. Key Themes of Existentialism

Although a highly diverse tradition of thought, seven themes can be identified that provide some sense of overall unity. Here, these themes will be briefly introduced; they can then provide us with an intellectual framework within which to discuss exemplary figures within the history of existentialism.

a. Philosophy as a Way of Life

Philosophy should not be thought of primarily either as an attempt to investigate and understand the self or the world, or as a special occupation that concerns only a few. Rather, philosophy must be thought of as fully integrated within life. To be sure, there may need to be professional philosophers, who develop an elaborate set of methods and concepts (Sartre makes this point frequently) but life can be lived philosophically without a technical knowledge of philosophy.  Existentialist thinkers tended to identify two historical antecedents for this notion. First, the ancient Greeks, and particularly the figure of Socrates but also the Stoics and Epicureans. Socrates was not only non-professional, but in his pursuit of the good life he tended to eschew the formation of a 'system' or 'theory', and his teachings took place often in public spaces. In this, the existentialists were hardly unusual. In the 19th and 20th centuries, the rapid expansion of industrialisation and advance in technology were often seen in terms of an alienation of the human from nature or from a properly natural way of living (for example, thinkers of German and English romanticism).

The second influence on thinking of philosophy as a way of life was German Idealism after Kant. Partly as a response to the 18th century Enlightenment, and under the influence of the Neoplatonists, Schelling and Hegel both thought of philosophy as an activity that is an integral part of the history of human beings, rather than outside of life and the world, looking on. Later in the 19th century, Marx famously criticised previous philosophy by saying that the point of philosophy is not to know things – even to know things about activity – but to change them.  The concept of philosophy as a way of life manifests itself in existentialist thought in a number of ways. Let us give several examples, to which we will return in the sections that follow. First, the existentialists often undertook a critique of modern life in terms of the specialisation of both manual and intellectual labour. Specialisation included philosophy. One consequence of this is that many existentialist thinkers experimented with different styles or genres of writing in order to escape the effects of this specialisation. Second, a notion that we can call 'immanence': philosophy studies life from the inside. For Kierkegaard, for example, the fundamental truths of my existence are not representations – not, that is, ideas, propositions or symbols the meaning of which can be separated from their origin. Rather, the truths of existence are immediately lived, felt and acted. Likewise, for Nietzsche and Heidegger, it is essential to recognise that the philosopher investigating human existence is, him or herself, an existing human. Third, the nature of life itself is a perennial existentialist concern and, more famously (in Heidegger and in Camus), also the significance of death.

b. Anxiety and Authenticity

A key idea here is that human existence is in some way 'on its own'; anxiety (or anguish) is the recognition of this fact. Anxiety here has two important implications. First, most generally, many existentialists tended to stress the significance of emotions or feelings, in so far as they were presumed to have a less culturally or intellectually mediated relation to one's individual and separate existence. This idea is found in Kierkegaard, as we mentioned above, and in Heidegger's discussion of 'mood'; it is also one reason why existentialism had an influence on psychology. Second, anxiety also stands for a form of existence that is recognition of being on its own. What is meant by 'being on its own' varies among philosophers. For example, it might mean the irrelevance (or even negative influence) of rational thought, moral values, or empirical evidence, when it comes to making fundamental decisions concerning one's existence. As we shall see, Kierkegaard sees Hegel's account of religion in terms of the history of absolute spirit as an exemplary confusion of faith and reason. Alternatively, it might be a more specifically theological claim: the existence of a transcendent deity is not relevant to (or is positively detrimental to) such decisions (a view broadly shared by Nietzsche and Sartre). Finally, being on its own might signify the uniqueness of human existence, and thus the fact that it cannot understand itself in terms of other kinds of existence (Heidegger and Sartre).

Related to anxiety is the concept of authenticity, which is let us say the existentialist spin on the Greek notion of 'the good life'. As we shall see, the authentic being would be able to recognise and affirm the nature of existence (we shall shortly specify some of the aspects of this, such as absurdity and freedom). Not, though, recognise the nature of existence as an intellectual fact, disengaged from life; but rather, the authentic being lives in accordance with this nature. The notion of authenticity is sometimes seen as connected to individualism. This is only reinforced by the contrast with a theme we will discuss below, that of the 'crowd'. Certainly, if authenticity involves 'being on one's own', then there would seem to be some kind of value in celebrating and sustaining one's difference and independence from others. However, many existentialists see individualism as a historical and cultural trend (for example Nietzsche), or dubious political value (Camus), rather than a necessary component of authentic existence. Individualism tends to obscure the particular types of collectivity that various existentialists deem important.

For many existentialists, the conditions of the modern world make authenticity especially difficult. For example, many existentialists would join other philosophers (such as the Frankfurt School) in condemning an instrumentalist conception of reason and value. The utilitarianism of Mill measured moral value and justice also in terms of the consequences of actions. Later liberalism would seek to absorb nearly all functions of political and social life under the heading of economic performance. Evaluating solely in terms of the measurable outcomes of production was seen as reinforcing the secularisation of the institutions of political, social or economic life; and reinforcing also the abandonment of any broader sense of the spiritual dimension (such an idea is found acutely in Emerson, and is akin to the concerns of Kierkegaard). Existentialists such as Martin Heidegger, Hanna Arendt or Gabriel Marcel viewed these social movements in terms of a narrowing of the possibilities of human thought to the instrumental or technological. This narrowing involved thinking of the world in terms of resources, and thinking of all human action as a making, or indeed as a machine-like 'function'.

c. Freedom

The next key theme is freedom. Freedom can usefully be linked to the concept of anguish, because my freedom is in part defined by the isolation of my decisions from any determination by a deity, or by previously existent values or knowledge. Many existentialists identified the 19th and 20th centuries as experiencing a crisis of values. This might be traced back to familiar reasons such as an increasingly secular society, or the rise of scientific or philosophical movements that questioned traditional accounts of value (for example Marxism or Darwinism), or the shattering experience of two world wars and the phenomenon of mass genocide. It is important to note, however, that for existentialism these historical conditions do not create the problem of anguish in the face of freedom, but merely cast it into higher relief. Likewise, freedom entails something like responsibility, for myself and for my actions. Given that my situation is one of being on its own – recognised in anxiety – then both my freedom and my responsibility are absolute. The isolation that we discussed above means that there is nothing else that acts through me, or that shoulders my responsibility. Likewise, unless human existence is to be understood as arbitrarily changing moment to moment, this freedom and responsibility must stretch across time. Thus, when I exist as an authentically free being, I assume responsibility for my whole life, for a ‘project’ or a ‘commitment’. We should note here that many of the existentialists take on a broadly Kantian notion of freedom: freedom as autonomy. This means that freedom, rather than being randomness or arbitrariness, consists in the binding of oneself to a law, but a law that is given by the self in recognition of its responsibilities. This borrowing from Kant, however, is heavily qualified by the next theme.

d. Situatedness

The next common theme we shall call ‘situatedness’. Although my freedom is absolute, it always takes place in a particular context. My body and its characteristics, my circumstances in a historical world, and my past, all weigh upon freedom. This is what makes freedom meaningful. Suppose I tried to exist as free, while pretending to be in abstraction from the situation. In that case I will have no idea what possibilities are open to me and what choices need to be made, here and now. In such a case, my freedom will be naïve or illusory. This concrete notion of freedom has its philosophical genesis in Hegel, and is generally contrasted to the pure rational freedom described by Kant. Situatedness is related to a notion we discussed above under the heading of philosophy as a way of life: the necessity of viewing or understanding life and existence from the ‘inside’.  For example, many 19th century intellectuals were interested in ancient Greece, Rome, the Medieval period, or the orient, as alternative models of a less spoiled, more integrated form of life. Nietzsche, to be sure, shared these interests, but he did so not uncritically: because the human condition is characterised by being historically situated, it cannot simply turn back the clock or decide all at once to be other than it is (Sartre especially shares this view). Heidegger expresses a related point in this way: human existence cannot be abstracted from its world because being-in-the-world is part of the ontological structure of that existence. Many existentialists take my concretely individual body, and the specific type of life that my body lives, as a primary fact about me (for example, Nietzsche, Scheler or Merleau-Ponty). I must also be situated socially: each of my acts says something about how I view others but, reciprocally, each of their acts is a view about what I am. My freedom is always situated with respect to the judgements of others. This particular notion comes from Hegel’s analysis of ‘recognition’, and is found especially in Sartre, de Beauvoir and Jaspers. Situatedness in general also has an important philosophical antecedent in Marx: economic and political conditions are not contingent features with respect to universal human nature, but condition that nature from the ground up.

e. Existence

Although, of course, existentialism takes its name from the philosophical theme of 'existence', this does not entail that there is homogeneity in the manner existence is to be understood. One point on which there is agreement, though, is that the existence with which we should be concerned here is not just any existent thing, but human existence. There is thus an important difference between distinctively human existence and anything else, and human existence is not to be understood on the model of things, that is, as objects of knowledge. One might think that this is an old idea, rooted in Plato's distinction between matter and soul, or Descartes' between extended and thinking things. But these distinctions appear to be just differences between two types of things. Descartes in particular, however, is often criticised by the existentialists for subsuming both under the heading 'substance', and thus treating what is distinctive in human existence as indeed a thing or object, albeit one with different properties. (Whether the existentialist characterisation of Plato or Descartes is accurate is a different question.) The existentialists thus countered the Platonic or Cartesian conception with a model that resembles more the Aristotelian as developed in the Nichomachean Ethics. The latter idea arrives in existentialist thought filtered through Leibniz and Spinoza and the notion of a striving for existence. Equally important is the elevation of the practical above the theoretical in German Idealists. Particularly in Kant, who stressed the primacy of the 'practical', and then in Fichte and early Schelling, we find the notion that human existence is action. Accordingly, in Nietzsche and Sartre we find the notion that the human being is all and only what that being does. My existence consists of forever bringing myself into being – and, correlatively, fleeing from the dead, inert thing that is the totality of my past actions. Although my acts are free, I am not free not to act; thus existence is characterised also by 'exigency' (Marcel). For many existentialists, authentic existence involves a certain tension be recognised and lived through, but not resolved: this tension might be between the animal and the rational (important in Nietzsche) or between facticity and transcendence (Sartre and de Beauvoir).

In the 19th and 20th centuries, the human sciences (such as psychology, sociology or economics) were coming to be recognised as powerful and legitimate sciences. To some extend at least their assumptions and methods seemed to be borrowed from the natural sciences. While philosophers such as Dilthey and later Gadamer were concerned to show that the human sciences had to have a distinctive method, the existentialists were inclined to go further. The free, situated human being is not an object of knowledge in the sense the human always exists as the possibility of transcending any knowledge of it. There is a clear relation between such an idea and the notion of the 'transcendence of the other' found in the ethical phenomenology of Emmanuel Levinas.

f. Irrationality/Absurdity

Among the most famous ideas associated with existentialism is that of 'absurdity'. Human existence might be described as 'absurd' in one of the following senses. First, many existentialists argued that nature as a whole has no design, no reason for existing. Although the natural world can apparently be understood by physical science or metaphysics, this might be better thought of as 'description' than either understanding or explanation. Thus, the achievements of the natural sciences also empty nature of value and meaning. Unlike a created cosmos, for example, we cannot expect the scientifically described cosmos to answer our questions concerning value or meaning. Moreover, such description comes at the cost of a profound falsification of nature: namely, the positing of ideal entities such as 'laws of nature', or the conflation of all reality under a single model of being. Human beings can and should become profoundly aware of this lack of reason and the impossibility of an immanent understanding of it. Camus, for example, argues that the basic scene of human existence is its confrontation with this mute irrationality.  A second meaning of the absurd is this: my freedom will not only be undetermined by knowledge or reason, but from the point of view of the latter my freedom will even appear absurd. Absurdity is thus closely related to the theme of 'being on its own', which we discussed above under the heading of anxiety. Even if I choose to follow a law that I have given myself, my choice of law will appear absurd, and likewise will my continuously reaffirmed choice to follow it. Third, human existence as action is doomed to always destroy itself. A free action, once done, is no longer free; it has become an aspect of the world, a thing. The absurdity of human existence then seems to lie in the fact that in becoming myself (a free existence) I must be what I am not (a thing).  If I do not face up to this absurdity, and choose to be or pretend to be thing-like, I exist inauthentically (the terms in this formulation are Sartre's).

g. The Crowd

Existentialism generally also carries a social or political dimension. Insofar as he or she is authentic, the freedom of the human being will show a certain 'resolution' or 'commitment', and this will involve also the being – and particularly the authentic being – of others. For example, Nietzsche thus speaks of his (or Zarathustra's) work in aiding the transformation of the human, and there is also in Nietzsche a striking analysis of the concept of friendship; for Heidegger, there must be an authentic mode of being-with others, although he does not develop this idea at length; the social and political aspect of authentic commitment is much more clear in Sartre, de Beauvoir and Camus.

That is the positive side of the social or political dimension. However, leading up to this positive side, there is a description of the typical forms that inauthentic social or political existence takes. Many existentialists employ terms such as 'crowd', 'horde' (Scheler) or the 'masses' (José Ortega y Gasset). Nietzsche's deliberately provocative expression, 'the herd', portrays the bulk of humanity not only as animal, but as docile and domesticated animals. Notice that these are all collective terms: inauthenticity manifests itself as de-individuated or faceless. Instead of being formed authentically in freedom and anxiety, values are just accepted from others because ‘that is what everybody does’. These terms often carry a definite historical resonance, embodying a critique of specifically modern modes of human existence. All of the following might be seen as either causes or symptoms of a world that is 'fallen' or 'broken' (Marcel): the technology of mass communication (Nietzsche is particularly scathing about newspapers and journalists; in Two Ages, Kierkegaard says something very similar), empty religious observances, the specialisation of labour and social roles, urbanisation and industrialisation. The theme of the crowd poses a question also to the positive social or political dimension of existentialism: how could a collective form of existence ever be anything other than inauthentic? The 19th and 20th century presented a number of mass political ideologies which might be seen as posing a particularly challenging environment for authentic and free existence. For example, nationalism came in for criticism particularly by Nietzsche. Socialism and communism: after WWII, Sartre was certainly a communist, but even then unafraid to criticise both the French communist party and the Soviet Union for rigid or inadequately revolutionary thinking. Democracy: Aristotle in book 5 of his Politics distinguishes between democracy and ochlocracy, which latter essentially means rule by those incapable of ruling even themselves. Many existentialists would identify the latter with the American and especially French concept of 'democracy'. Nietzsche and Ortega y Gasset both espoused a broadly aristocratic criterion for social and political leadership.

2. Key Existentialist Philosophers

a. Søren Kierkegaard (1813-1855) as an Existentialist Philosopher

Kierkegaard was many things: philosopher, religious writer, satirist, psychologist, journalist, literary critic and generally considered the ‘father’ of existentialism. Being born (in Copenhagen) to a wealthy family enabled him to devote his life to the pursuits of his intellectual interests as well as to distancing himself from the ‘everyday man’ of his times.

Kierkegaard’s most important works are pseudonymous, written under fictional names, often very obviously fictional. The issue of pseudonymity has been variously interpreted as a literary device, a personal quirk or as an illustration of the constant tension between the philosophical truth and existential or personal truth. We have already seen that for the existentialists it is of equal importance what one says and the way in which something is said. This forms part of the attempt to return to a more authentic way of philosophising, firstly exemplified by the Greeks. In a work like Either/Or (primarily a treatise against the Hegelians) theoretical reflections are followed by reflections on how to seduce girls. The point is to stress the distance between the anonymously and logically produced truths of the logicians and the personal truths of existing individuals. Every pseudonymous author is a symbol for an existing individual and at times his very name is the key to the mysteries of his existence (like in the case of Johanes de Silentio, fictional author of Fear and Trembling, where the mystery of Abraham’s actions cannot be told, being a product of and belonging to silence).

Kierkegaard has been associated with a notion of truth as subjective (or personal); but what does this mean? The issue is linked with his notorious confrontation with the Danish Church and the academic environment of his days. Kierkegaard’s work takes place against the background of an academia dominated by Hegelian dialectics and a society which reduces the communication with the divine to the everyday observance of the ritualistic side of an institutionalized Christianity. Hegel is for Kierkegaard his arch-enemy not only because of what he writes but also what he represents. Hegel is guilty for Kierkegaard because he reduced the living truth of Christianity (the fact that God suffered and died on the Cross) to just another moment, which necessarily will be overcome, in the dialectical development of the Spirit. While Hegel treats “God” as a Begriff (a concept), for Kierkegaard the truth of Christianity signifies the very paradoxicality of faith: that is, that it is possible for the individual to go beyond the ‘ethical’ and nevertheless or rather because of this very act of disobedience to be loved by ‘God’. Famously, for Hegel ‘all that is real is rational’ – where rationality means the historically articulated, dialectical progression of Spirit – whereas for Kierkegaard the suspension of rationality is the very secret of Christianity. Against the cold logic of the Hegelian system Kierkegaard seeks “a truth which is truth for me” (Kierkegaard 1996:32). Christianity in particular represents the attempt to offer one’s life to the service of the divine. This cannot be argued, it can only be lived. While a theologian will try to argue for the validity of his positions by arguing and counter-arguing, a true Christian will try to live his life the way Jesus lived it. This evidently marks the continuation of the Hellenic idea of philosophy as a way of life, exemplified in the person of Socrates who did not write treatises, but who died for his ideas. Before the logical concepts of the theologians (in the words of Martin Heidegger who was hugely influenced by Kierkegaard) “man can neither fall to his knees in awe nor can he play music and dance before this god” (Heidegger 2002:42). The idea of ‘subjective truth’ will have serious consequences to the philosophical understanding of man. Traditionally defined as animale rationale (the rational animal) by Aristotle and for a long time worshiped as such by generations of philosophical minds, Kierkegaard comes now to redefine the human as the ‘passionate animal’. What counts in man is the intensity of his emotions and his willingness to believe (contra the once all powerful reason) in that which cannot be understood. The opening up by Kierkegaard of this terra incognita of man’s inner life will come to play a major role for later existentialists (most importantly for Nietzsche) and will bring to light the failings and the weaknesses of an over-optimistic (because modelled after the Natural sciences) model of philosophy which was taught to talk a lot concerning the ‘truth’ of the human, when all it understood about the human was a mutilated version.

In the Garden of Eden, Adam and Eve lived in a state of innocence in communication with God and in harmony with their physical environment. The expulsion from the Garden opened up a wide range of new possibilities for them and thus the problem of anxiety arose. Adam (the Hebrew word for man) is now free to determine through his actions the route of things. Naturally, there is a tension here. The human, created in God’s image, is an infinite being. Like God he also can choose and act according to his will. Simultaneously, though, he is a finite being since he is restricted by his body, particular socioeconomic conditions and so forth. This tension between the finite and infinite is the source of anxiety. But unlike a Hegelian analysis, Kierkegaard does not look for a way out from anxiety; on the contrary he stresses its positive role in the flourishing of the human. As he characteristically puts it: “Because he is a synthesis, he can be in anxiety; and the more profoundly he is in anxiety, the greater is the man” (Kierkegaard 1980:154). The prioritization of anxiety as a fundamental trait of the human being is a typical existentialist move, eager to assert the positive role of emotions for human life.

Perhaps the most famous work of Kierkegaard was Fear and Trembling, a short book which exhibits many of the issues raised by him throughout his career. Fear and Trembling retells the story of the attempted sacrifice of Isaac by his father Abraham. God tells Abraham that in order to prove his faith he has to sacrifice his only son. Abraham obeys, but at the last moment God intervenes and saves Isaac. What is the moral of the story? According to our moral beliefs, shouldn’t Abraham refuse to execute God’s vicious plan? Isn’t one of the fundamental beliefs of Christianity the respect to the life of other? The answer is naturally affirmative. Abraham should refuse God, and he should respect the ethical law. Then Abraham would be in a good relation with the Law itself as in the expression ‘a law abiding citizen’. On the contrary what Abraham tries to achieve is a personal relation with the author of the moral law. This author is neither a symbolic figure nor an abstract idea; he is someone with a name. The name of ’God’ is the unpronounceable Tetragrammaton (YHVE), the unpronounceability indicates the simultaneous closeness and distance of the great Other. The Christian God then, the author of the moral law at his will suspends the law and demands his unlawful wish be obeyed. Jacques Derrida notes that the temptation is now for Abraham the ethical law itself (Derrida 1998:162): he must resist ethics, this is the mad logic of God. The story naturally raises many problems. Is not such a subjectivist model of truth and religion plainly dangerous? What if someone was to support his acts of violence as a command of God? Kierkegaard’s response would be to suggest that it is only because Abraham loved Isaac with all his heart that the sacrifice could take place. “He must love Isaac with his whole soul....only then can he sacrifice him” (Kierkegaard 1983:74). Abraham’s faith is proved by the strength of his love for his son. However, this doesn’t fully answer the question of legitimacy, even if we agree that Abraham believed that God loved him so that he would somehow spare him. Kierkegaard also differentiates between the act of Abraham and the act of a tragic hero (like Agamemnon sacrificing his daughter Iphigenia). The tragic hero’s act is a product of calculation. What is better to do? What would be more beneficial? Abraham stands away from all sorts of calculations, he stands alone, that is, free in front of the horror religiosus, the price and the reward of faith.

b. Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900) as an Existentialist Philosopher

“I know my lot. Some day my name will be linked to the memory of something monstrous, of a crisis as yet unprecedented on earth...” (Nietzsche 2007:88).  Remarkably, what in 1888 sounded like megalomania came some years later to be realized. The name ‘Nietzsche’ has been linked with an array of historical events, philosophical concepts and widespread popular legends. Above all, Nietzsche has managed somehow to associate his name with the turmoil of a crisis. For a while this crisis was linked to the events of WWII. The exploitation of his teaching by the Nazi ideologues (notably Alfred Rosenberg and Alfred Baeumler), although utterly misdirected, arguably had its source in Nietzsche’s own “aristocratic radicalism”. More generally, the crisis refers to the prospect of a future lacking of any meaning. This is a common theme for all the existentialists to be sure. The prospect of millennia of nihilism (the devaluation of the highest values) inaugurates for Nietzsche the era in which the human itself, for the first time in its history, is called to give meaning both to its own existence and to the existence of the world. This is an event of a cataclysmic magnitude, from now on there are neither guidelines to be followed, lighthouses to direct us, and no right answers but only experiments to be conducted with unknown results.

Many existentialists, in their attempt to differentiate the value of individual existence from the alienating effects of the masses, formed an uneasy relation with the value of the ‘everyday man’. The ‘common’ man was thought to be lacking in will, taste in matter of aesthetics, and individuality in the sense that the assertion of his existence comes exclusively from his participation in larger groups and from the ‘herd’ mentality with which these groups infuse their members. Nietzsche believed that men in society are divided and ordered according to their willingness and capacity to participate in a life of spiritual and cultural transformation. Certainly not everyone wishes this participation and Nietzsche’s condemnation of those unwilling to challenge their fundamental beliefs is harsh; however it would be a mistake to suggest that Nietzsche thought their presence dispensable. In various aphorisms he stresses the importance of the ‘common’ as a necessary prerequisite for both the growth and the value of the ‘exceptional’. Such an idea clashes with our ‘modern’ sensitivities (themselves a product of a particular training). However, one has to recognize that there are no philosophers without presuppositions, and that Nietzsche’s insistence on the value of the exceptional marks his own beginning and his own understanding of the mission of thought.

Despite the dubious politics that the crisis of meaning gave rise to, the crisis itself is only an after-effect of a larger and deeper challenge that Nietzsche’s work identifies and poses. For Nietzsche the crisis of meaning is inextricably linked to the crisis of religious consciousness in the West. Whereas for Kierkegaard the problem of meaning was to be resolved through the individual’s relation to the Divine, for Nietzsche the militantly anti-Christian, the problem of meaning is rendered possible at all because of the demise of the Divine. As he explains in The Genealogy of Morality, it is only after the cultivation of truth as a value by the priest that truth comes to question its own value and function. What truth discovers is that at the ground of all truth lies an unquestionable faith in the value of truth. Christianity is destroyed when it is pushed to tell the truth about itself, when the illusions of the old ideals are revealed. What is called ‘The death of God’ is also then the death of truth (though not of the value of truthfulness); this is an event of immense consequences for the future.

But one has to be careful here. Generations of readers, by concentrating on the event of the actual announcement of the 'death of God', have completely missed madman’s woeful mourning which follows the announcement. “‘Where is God?’ he cried; ‘I‘ll tell you! We have killed him – you and I! We are all his murderers. But how did we do this? How were we able to drink up the sea? Who gave us the sponge to wipe away the entire horizon? What were we doing when we unchained this earth from its sun? Where is it moving? Where are we moving to? Away from all suns?” (Nietzsche 2001:125). The above sentences are very far from constituting a cheerful declaration: no one is happy here! Nietzsche’s atheism has nothing to do with the naive atheism of others (for example Sartre) who rush to affirm their freedom as if their petty individuality were able to fill the vast empty space left by the absence of God. Nietzsche is not naive and because he is not naive he is rather pessimistic. What the death of God really announces is the demise of the human as we know it. One has to think of this break in the history of the human in Kantian terms. Kant famously described Enlightenment as “man’s emergence from his self-incurred immaturity” (Kant 1991:54). Similarly Nietzsche believes that the demise of the divine could be the opportunity for the emergence of a being which derives the meaning of its existence from within itself and not from some authority external to it. If the meaning of the human derived from God then, with the universe empty, man cannot take the place of the absent God. This empty space can only be filled by something greater and fuller, which in the Nietzschean jargon means the greatest unity of contradictory forces. That is the Übermensch (Overhuman) which for Nietzsche signifies the attempt towards the cultural production of a human being which will be aware of his dual descent – from animality and from rationality – without prioritizing either one, but keeping them in an agonistic balance so that through struggle new and exciting forms of human existence can be born.

Nietzsche was by training a Klassische Philologe (the rough equivalent Anglosaxon would be an expert in classics – the texts of the ancient Greek and Roman authors). Perhaps because of his close acquaintance with the ancient writers, he became sensitive to a quite different understanding of philosophical thinking to that of his contemporaries. For the Greeks, philosophical questioning takes place within the perspective of a certain choice of life. There is no ‘life’ and then quite separately the theoretical (theoria: from thea – view, and horan – to see) or 'from a distance' contemplation of phenomena. Philosophical speculation is the result of a certain way of life and the attempted justification of this life. Interestingly Kant encapsulates this attitude in the following passage: “When will you finally begin to live virtuously?’ said Plato to an old man who told him he was attending classes on virtue. The point is not always to speculate, but also ultimately to think about applying our knowledge. Today, however, he who lives in conformity with what he teaches is taken for a dreamer” (Kant in Hadot 2002:xiii). We have to understand Nietzsche’s relation to philosophy within this context not only because it illustrates a stylistically different contemplation but because it demonstrates an altogether different way of philosophizing. Thus in Twilight of the Idols Nietzsche accuses philosophers for their ‘Egyptism’, the fact that they turn everything into a concept under evaluation. “All that philosophers have been handling for thousands of years is conceptual mummies; nothing real has ever left their hands alive” (Nietzsche 1998:16). Philosophical concepts are valuable insofar as they serve a flourishing life, not as academic exercises. Under the new model of philosophy the old metaphysical and moral questions are to be replaced by new questions concerning history, genealogy, environmental conditions and so forth. Let us take a characteristic passage from 1888: “I am interested in a question on which the ‘salvation of humanity’ depends more than on any curio of the theologians: the question of nutrition. For ease of use, one can put it in the following terms: ‘how do you personally have to nourish yourself in order to attain your maximum of strength, of virtù in the Renaissance style, of moraline-free virtue?” (Nietzsche 2007:19).

What is Nietzsche telling us here? Two things: firstly that, following the tradition of Spinoza, the movement from transcendence to immanence passes through the rehabilitation of the body. To say that, however, does not imply a simple-minded materialism. When Spinoza tells “nobody as yet has determined the limits of the body’s capabilities” (Spinoza 2002: 280) he is not writing about something like bodily strength but to the possibility of an emergence of a body liberated from the sedimentation of culture and memory. This archetypical body is indeed as yet unknown and we stand in ignorance of its abilities. The second thing that Nietzsche is telling us in the above passage is that this new immanent philosophy necessarily requires a new ethics. One has to be clear here because of the many misunderstandings of Nietzschean ethics. Nietzsche is primarily a philosopher of ethics but ethics here refers to the possible justification of a way of life, which way of life in turn justifies human existence on earth. For Nietzsche, ethics does not refer to moral codes and guidelines on how to live one’s life. Morality, which Nietzsche rejects, refers to the obsessive need (a need or an instinct can also be learned according to Nietzsche) of the human to preserve its own species and to regard its species as higher than the other animals. In short morality is arrogant. A Nietzschean ethics is an ethics of modesty. It places the human back where it belongs, among the other animals. However to say that is not to equate the human with the animal. Unlike non-human animals men are products of history that is to say products of memory. That is their burden and their responsibility.

In the Genealogy of Morality Nietzsche explains morality as a system aiming at the taming of the human animal. Morality’s aim is the elimination of the creative power of animal instincts and the establishment of a life protected within the cocoon of ascetic ideals. These 'ideals' are all those values and ideologies made to protect man against the danger of nihilism, the state in which man finds no answer to the question of his existence. Morality clings to the preservation of the species ‘man’; morality stubbornly denies the very possibility of an open-ended future for humans. If we could summarize Nietzsche’s philosophical anthropology in a few words, we would say that for Nietzsche it is necessary to attempt (there are no guarantees here) to think of the human not as an end-in-itself but only as a means to something “...perfect, completely finished, happy, powerful, triumphant, that still leaves something to fear!” (Nietzsche 2007:25).

c. Martin Heidegger (1889-1976) as an Existentialist Philosopher

Heidegger exercised an unparalleled influence on modern thought. Without knowledge of his work recent developments in modern European philosophy (Sartre, Gadamer, Arendt, Marcuse, Derrida, Foucault et al.) simply do not make sense. He remains notorious for his involvement with National Socialism in the 1930s. Outside European philosophy, Heidegger is only occasionally taken seriously, and is sometimes actually ridiculed (famously the Oxford philosopher A.J. Ayer called him a ‘charlatan’).

In 1945 in Paris Jean-Paul Sartre gave a public lecture with the title ‘Existentialism is a Humanism’ where he defended the priority of action and the position that it is a man’s actions which define his humanity. In 1946, Jean Beaufret in a letter to Heidegger poses a number of questions concerning the link between humanism and the recent developments of existentialist philosophy in France. Heidegger’s response is a letter to Beaufret which in 1947 is published in a book form with the title ‘Letter on Humanism’. There he repudiates any possible connection of his philosophy with the existentialism of Sartre. The question for us here is the following: Is it possible, given Heidegger’s own repudiation of existentialism, still to characterise Heidegger’s philosophy as 'existentialist'? The answer here is that Heidegger can be classified as an existentialist thinker despite all his differences from Sartre. Our strategy is to stress Heidegger’s connection with some key existentialist concerns, which we introduced above under the labels ‘Existence’, ‘Anxiety’ and the ‘Crowd’.

We have seen above that a principle concern of all existentialists was to affirm the priority of individual existence and to stress that human existence is to be investigated with methods other than those of the natural sciences. This is also one of Heidegger’s principle concerns. His magnum opus Being and Time is an investigation into the meaning of Being as that manifests itself through the human being, Dasein. The sciences have repeatedly asked ‘What is a man?’ ‘What is a car?’ ‘What is an emotion?’ they have nevertheless failed – and because of the nature of science, had to fail – to ask the question which grounds all those other questions. This question is what is the meaning of (that) Being which is not an entity (like other beings, for example a chair, a car, a rock) and yet through it entities have meaning at all? Investigating the question of the meaning of Being we discover that it arises only because it is made possible by the human being which poses the question. Dasein has already a (pre-conceptual) understanding of Being because it is the place where Being manifests itself. Unlike the traditional understanding of the human as a hypokeimenon (Aristotle) – what through the filtering of Greek thought by the Romans becomes substantia, that which supports all entities and qualities as their base and their ground – Dasein refers to the way which human beings are. ”The essence of Dasein lies in its existence” (Heidegger 1962: 67) and the existence of Dasein is not fixed like the existence of a substance is. This is why human beings locate a place which nevertheless remains unstable and unfixed. The virtual place that Dasein occupies is not empty. It is filled with beings which ontologically structure the very possibility of Dasein. Dasein exists as in-the-world. World is not something separate from Dasein; rather, Dasein cannot be understood outside the referential totality which constitutes it. Heidegger repeats here a familiar existentialist pattern regarding the situatedness of experience.

Sartre, by contrast, comes from the tradition of Descartes and to this tradition remains faithful. From Heidegger's perspective, Sartre’s strategy of affirming the priority of existence over essence is a by-product of the tradition of Renaissance humanism which wishes to assert the importance of man as the highest and most splendid of finite beings. Sartrean existence refers to the fact that a human is whereas Heidegger’s ek-sistence refers to the way with which Dasein is thrown into a world of referential relations and as such Dasein is claimed by Being to guard its truth. Sartre, following Descartes, thinks of the human as a substance producing or sustaining entities, Heidegger on the contrary thinks of the human as a passivity which accepts the call of Being. “Man is not the lord of beings. Man is the shepherd of Being” (Heidegger 1993:245). The Heideggerian priority then is Being, and Dasein’s importance lies in its receptiveness to the call of Being.

For Kierkegaard anxiety defines the possibility of responsibility, the exodus of man from the innocence of Eden and his participation to history. But the birthplace of anxiety is the experience of nothingness, the state in which every entity is experienced as withdrawn from its functionality. “Nothing ... gives birth to anxiety” (Kierkegaard 1980:41). In anxiety we do not fear something in particular but we experience the terror of a vacuum in which is existence is thrown. Existentialist thinkers are interested in anxiety because anxiety individualizes one (it is when I feel Angst more than everything that I come face to face with my own individual existence as distinct from all other entities around me). Heidegger thinks that one of the fundamental ways with which Dasein understands itself in the world is through an array of ‘moods’. Dasein always ‘finds itself’ (befinden sich) in a certain mood. Man is not a thinking thing de-associated from the world, as in Cartesian metaphysics, but a being which finds itself in various moods such as anxiety or boredom. For the Existentialists, primarily and for the most part I don’t exist because I think (recall Descartes’ famous formula) but because my moods reveal to me fundamental truths of my existence. Like Kierkegaard, Heidegger also believes that anxiety is born out of the terror of nothingness. “The obstinacy of the ‘nothing and nowhere within-the-world’ means as a phenomenon that the world as such is that in the face of which one has anxiety” (Heidegger 1962:231). For Kierkegaard the possibility of anxiety reveals man’s dual nature and because of this duality man can be saved. “If a human being were a beast or an angel, he could not be in anxiety. Because he is a synthesis, he can be in anxiety; and the more profoundly he is in anxiety, the greater is the man” (Kierkegaard 1980:155). Equally for Heidegger anxiety manifests Dasein’s possibility to live an authentic existence since it realizes that the crowd of ‘others’ (what Heidegger calls the ‘They’) cannot offer any consolation to the drama of existence.

In this article we have discussed the ambiguous or at times downright critical attitude of many existentialists toward the uncritical and unreflecting masses of people who, in a wholly anti-Kantian and thus also anti-Enlightenment move, locate the meaning of their existence in an external authority. They thus give up their (purported) autonomy as rational beings. For Heidegger, Dasein for the most part lives inauthentically in that Dasein is absorbed in a way of life produced by others, not by Dasein itself. “We take pleasure and enjoy ourselves as they [man] take pleasure; we read, see and judge about literature and art as they see and judge...” (Heidegger 1962:164). To be sure this mode of existence, the ‘They’ (Das Man) is one of the existentialia, it is an a priori condition of possibility of the Dasein which means that inauthenticity is inscribed into the mode of being of Dasein, it does not come from the outside as a bad influence which could be erased. Heidegger’s language is ambiguous on the problem of inauthenticity and the reader has to make his mind on the status of the ‘They’. A lot has been said on the possible connections of Heidegger’s philosophy with his political engagements. Although it is always a risky business to read the works of great philosophers as political manifestos, it seems prima facie evident that Heidegger’s thought in this area deserves the close investigation it has received.

Heidegger was a highly original thinker. His project was nothing less than the overcoming of Western metaphysics through the positing of the forgotten question of being. He stands in a critical relation to past philosophers but simultaneously he is heavily indebted to them, much more than he would like to admit. This is not to question his originality, it is to recognize that thought is not an ex nihilo production; it comes as a response to things past, and aims towards what is made possible through that past.

d. Jean-Paul Sartre (1905-1980) as an Existentialist Philosopher

In the public consciousness, at least, Sartre must surely be the central figure of existentialism. All the themes that we introduced above come together in his work. With the possible exception of Nietzsche, his writings are the most widely anthologised (especially the lovely, if oversimplifying, lecture 'Existentialism and Humanism') and his literary works are widely read (especially the novel Nausea) or performed. Although uncomfortable in the limelight, he was nevertheless the very model of a public intellectual, writing hundreds of short pieces for public dissemination and taking resolutely independent and often controversial stands on major political events. His writings that are most clearly existentialist in character date from Sartre's early and middle period, primarily the 1930s and 1940s. From the 1950s onwards, Sartre moved his existentialism towards a philosophy the purpose of which was to understand the possibility of a genuinely revolutionary politics.

Sartre was in his late 20s when he first encountered phenomenology, specifically the philosophical ideas of Edmund Husserl. (We should point out that Heidegger was also deeply influenced by Husserl, but it is less obvious in the language he employs because he drops the language of consciousness and acts.) Of particular importance, Sartre thought, was Husserl's notion of intentionality. In Sartre's interpretation of this idea, consciousness is not to be identified with a thing (for example a mind, soul or brain), that is to say some kind of a repository of ideas and images of things. Rather, consciousness is nothing but a directedness towards things. Sartre found a nice way to sum up the notion of the intentional object: If I love her, I love her because she is lovable (Sartre 1970:4-5).  Within my experience, her lovableness is not an aspect of my image of her, rather it is a feature of her (and ultimately a part of the world) towards which my consciousness directs itself. The things I notice about her (her smile, her laugh) are not originally neutral, and then I interpret the idea of them as 'lovely', they are aspects of her as lovable. The notion that consciousness is not a thing is vital to Sartre. Indeed, consciousness is primarily to be characterised as nothing: it is first and foremost not that which it is conscious of. (Sartre calls human existence the 'for-itself', and the being of things the 'in-itself'.) Because it is not a thing, it is not subject to the laws of things; specifically, it is not part of a chain of causes and its identity is not akin to that of a substance. Above we suggested that a concern with the nature of existence, and more particularly a concern with the distinctive nature of human existence, are defining existentialist themes.

Moreover, qua consciousness, and not a thing that is part of the causal chain, I am free. From moment to moment, my every action is mine alone to choose. I will of course have a past 'me' that cannot be dispensed with; this is part of my 'situation'. However, again, I am first and foremost not my situation. Thus, at every moment I choose whether to continue on that life path, or to be something else. Thus, my existence (the mere fact that I am) is prior to my essence (what I make of myself through my free choices). I am thus utterly responsible for myself. If my act is not simply whatever happens to come to mind, then my action may embody a more general principle of action. This principle too is one that I must have freely chosen and committed myself to. It is an image of the type of life that I believe has value. (In these ways, Sartre intersects with the broadly Kantian account of freedom which we introduced above in our thematic section.) As situated, I also find myself surrounded by such images – from religion, culture, politics or morality – but none compels my freedom. (All these forces that seek to appropriate my freedom by objectifying me form Sartre's version of the crowd theme.) I exist as freedom, primarily characterised as not determined, so my continuing existence requires the ever renewed exercise of freedom (thus, in our thematic discussion above, the notion from Spinoza and Leibniz of existence as a striving-to-exist). Thus also, my non-existence, and the non-existence of everything I believe in, is only a free choice away. I (in the sense of an authentic human existence) am not what I 'am' (the past I have accumulated, the things that surround me, or the way that others view me). I am alone in my responsibility; my existence, relative to everything external that might give it meaning, is absurd. Face to face with such responsibility, I feel 'anxiety'. Notice that although Sartre's account of situatedness owes much to Nietzsche and Heidegger, he sees it primarily in terms of what gives human freedom its meaning and its burden. Nietzsche and Heidegger, in contrast, view such a conception of freedom as naively metaphysical.

Suppose, however, that at some point I am conscious of myself in a thing-like way. For example, I say 'I am a student' (treating myself as having a fixed, thing-like identity) or 'I had no choice' (treating myself as belonging to the causal chain). I am ascribing a fixed identity or set of qualities to myself, much as I would say 'that is a piece of granite'. In that case I am existing in denial of my distinctively human mode of existence; I am fleeing from my freedom. This is inauthenticity or 'bad faith'. As we shall see, inauthenticity is not just an occasional pitfall of human life, but essential to it. Human existence is a constant falling away from an authentic recognition of its freedom. Sartre here thus echoes the notion in Heidegger than inauthenticity is a condition of possibility of human existence.

Intentionality manifests itself in another important way. Rarely if ever am I simply observing the world; instead I am involved in wanting to do something, I have a goal or purpose. Here, intentional consciousness is not a static directedness towards things, but is rather an active projection towards the future. Suppose that I undertake as my project marrying my beloved. This is an intentional relation to a future state of affairs. As free, I commit myself to this project and must reaffirm that commitment at every moment. It is part of my life project, the image of human life that I offer to myself and to others as something of value. Notice, however, that my project involves inauthenticity. I project myself into the future where I will be married to her – that is, I define myself as 'married', as if I were a fixed being. Thus there is an essential tension to all projection. On the one hand, the mere fact that I project myself into the future is emblematic of my freedom; only a radically free consciousness can project itself. I exist as projecting towards the future which, again, I am not. Thus, I am (in the sense of an authentic self) what I am not (because my projecting is always underway towards the future). On the other hand, in projecting I am projecting myself as something, that is, as a thing that no longer projects, has no future, is not free. Every action, then, is both an expression of freedom and also a snare of freedom. Projection is absurd: I seek to become the impossible object, for-itself-in-itself, a thing that is both free and a mere thing. Born of this tension is a recognition of freedom, what it entails, and its essential fragility. Thus, once again, we encounter existential anxiety. (In this article, we have not stressed the importance of the concept of time for existentialism, but it should not be overlooked: witness one of Nietzsche's most famous concepts (eternal recurrence) and the title of Heidegger's major early work (Being and Time).)

In my intentional directedness towards my beloved I find her 'loveable'. This too, though, is an objectification. Within my intentional gaze, she is loveable in much the same way that granite is hard or heavy. Insofar as I am in love, then, I seek to deny her freedom. Insofar, however, as I wish to be loved by her, then she must be free to choose me as her beloved. If she is free, she escapes my love; if not, she cannot love. It is in these terms that Sartre analyses love in Part Three of Being and Nothingness. Love here is a case study in the basic forms of social relation. Sartre is thus moving from an entirely individualistic frame of reference (my self, my freedom and my projects) towards a consideration of the self in concrete relations with others. Sartre is working through – in a way he would shortly see as being inadequate – the issues presented by the Hegelian dialectic of recognition, which we mentioned above. This 'hell' of endlessly circling acts of freedom and objectification is brilliantly dramatised in Sartre's play No Exit.

A few years later at the end of the 1940s, Sartre wrote what has been published as Notebooks for an Ethics. Sartre (influenced in the meantime by the criticisms of Merleau-Ponty and de Beauvoir, and by his increasing commitment to collectivist politics) elaborated greatly his existentialist account of relations with others, taking the Hegelian idea more seriously. He no longer thinks of concrete relations so pessimistically. While Nietzsche and Heidegger both suggest the possibility of an authentic being with others, both leave it seriously under-developed. For our purposes, there are two key ideas in the Notebooks. The first is that my projects can be realised only with the cooperation of others; however, that cooperation presupposes their freedom (I cannot make her love me), and their judgements about me must concern me. Therefore permitting and nurturing the freedom of others must be a central part of all my projects. Sartre thus commits himself against any political, social or economic forms of subjugation. Second, there is the possibility of a form of social organisation and action in which each individual freely gives him or herself over to a joint project: a 'city of ends' (this is a reworking of Kant's idea of the 'kingdom of ends', found in the Grounding for the Metaphysics of Morals). An authentic existence, for Sartre, therefore means two things. First, it is something like a 'style' of existing – one that at every moment is anxious, and that means fully aware of the absurdity and fragility of its freedom. Second, though, there is some minimal level of content to any authentic project: whatever else my project is, it must also be a project of freedom, for myself and for others.

e. Simone de Beauvoir (1908-1986) as an Existentialist Philosopher

Simone de Beauvoir was the youngest student ever to pass the demanding agrégation at the prestigious École Normale Supérieure. Subsequently a star Normalienne, she was a writer, philosopher, feminist, lifelong partner of Jean-Paul Sartre, notorious for her anti-bourgeois way of living and her free sexual relationships which included among others a passionate affair with the American writer Nelson Algren. Much ink has been spilled debating whether de Beauvoir’s work constitutes a body of independent philosophical work, or is a reformulation of Sartre’s work. The debate rests of course upon the fundamental misconception that wants a body of work to exist and develop independently of (or uninfluenced by) its intellectual environment. Such ‘objectivity’ is not only impossible but also undesirable: such a body of work would be ultimately irrelevant since it would be non-communicable. So the question of de Beauvoir’s ‘independence’ could be dismissed here as irrelevant to the philosophical questions that her work raises.

In 1943 Being and Nothingness, the groundwork of the Existentialist movement in France was published. There Sartre gave an account of freedom as ontological constitutive of the subject. One cannot but be free: this is the kernel of the Sartrean conception of freedom. In 1945 Merleau-Ponty’s Phenomenology of Perception is published. There, as well as in an essay from the same year titled 'The war has taken place', Merleau-Ponty heavily criticizes the Sartrean stand, criticising it as a reformulation of basic Stoic tenets. One cannot assume freedom in isolation from the freedom of others. Action is participatory: “…my freedom is interwoven with that of others by way of the world” (Merleau-Ponty in Stewart 1995:315).  Moreover action takes place within a certain historical context. For Merleau-Ponty the subjective free-will is always in a dialectical relationship with its historical context. In 1947 Simone de Beauvoir’s Ethics of Ambiguity is published. The book is an introduction to existentialism but also a subtle critique of Sartre’s position on freedom, and a partial extension of existentialism towards the social. Although de Beauvoir will echo Merleau-Ponty’s criticism regarding the essential interrelation of the subjects, nevertheless she will leave unstressed the importance that the social context plays in the explication of moral problems. Like Sartre it is only later in her life that this will be acknowledged. In any case, de Beauvoir’s book precipitates in turn a major rethink on Sartre’s part, and the result is the Notebooks for an Ethics.

In Ethics of Ambiguity de Beauvoir offers a picture of the human subject as constantly oscillating between facticity and transcendence. Whereas the human is always already restricted by the brute facts of his existence, nevertheless it always aspires to overcome its situation, to choose its freedom and thus to create itself. This tension must be considered positive, and not restrictive of action. It is exactly because the ontology of the human is a battleground of antithetical movements (a view consistent with de Beauvoir’s Hegelianism) that the subject must produce an ethics which will be continuous with its ontological core. The term for this tension is ambiguity. Ambiguity is not a quality of the human as substance, but a characterisation of human existence. We are ambiguous beings destined to throw ourselves into the future while simultaneously it is our very own existence that throws us back into facticity. That is to say, back to the brute fact that we are in a sense always already destined to fail –  not in this or that particular project but to fail as pure and sustained transcendence. It is exactly because of (and through) this fundamental failure that we realize that our ethical relation to the world cannot be self-referential but must pass through the realization of the common destiny of the human as a failed and interrelated being.

De Beauvoir, unlike Sartre, was a scholarly reader of Hegel. Her position on an existential ethics is thus more heavily influenced by Hegel’s view in the Phenomenology of Spirit concerning the moment of recognition (Hegel 1977:111). There Hegel describes the movement in which self-consciousness produces itself by positing another would be self-consciousness, not as a mute object (Gegen-stand) but as itself self-consciousness. The Hegelian movement remains one of the most fascinating moments in the history of philosophy since it is for the first time that the constitution of the self does not take place from within the self (as happens with Descartes, for whom the only truth is the truth of my existence; or Leibniz, for whom the monads are ‘windowless’; or Fichte, for whom the ‘I’ is absolutely self-constitutive) but from the outside. It is, Hegel tells us, only because someone else recognizes me as a subject that I can be constituted as such. Outside the moment of recognition there is no self-consciousness. De Beauvoir takes to heart the Hegelian lesson and tries to formulate an ethics from it.

What would this ethics be? As in Nietzsche, ethics refers to a way of life (a βίος), as opposed to morality which concerns approved or condemned behaviour. Thus there are no recipes for ethics. Drawn from Hegel’s moment of recognition, de Beauvoir acknowledges that the possibility of human flourishing is based firstly upon the recognition of the existence of the other (“Man can find a justification of his own existence only in the existence of the other men” (Beauvoir 1976:72) and secondly on the recognition that my own flourishing (or my ability to pose projects, in the language of existentialists) passes through the possibility of a common flourishing. “Only the freedom of others keeps each one of us from hardening in the absurdity of facticity,” (Beauvoir 1976:71) de Beauvoir writes; or again “To will oneself free is also to will others free” (Beauvoir 1976:73). The Ethics of Ambiguity ends by declaring the necessity of assuming one’s freedom and the assertion that it is only through action that freedom makes itself possible. This is not a point to be taken light-heartedly. It constitutes a movement of opposition against a long tradition of philosophy understanding itself as theoria: the disinterested contemplation on the nature of the human and the world. De Beauvoir, in common with most existentialists, understands philosophy as praxis: involved action in the world and participation in the course of history. It is out of this understanding that The Second Sex is born.

In 1949 Le Deuxième Sexe is published in France. In English in 1953 it appeared as The Second Sex in an abridged translation. The book immediately became a best seller and later a founding text of Second Wave Feminism (the feminist movement from the early 60’s to the 70’s inspired by the civil rights movement and focusing at the theoretical examination of the concepts of equality, inequality, the role of family, justice and so forth). More than anything, The Second Sex constitutes a study in applied existentialism where the abstract concept ‘Woman’ gives way to the examination of the lives of everyday persons struggling against oppression and humiliation. When de Beauvoir says that there is no such thing as a ‘Woman’ we have to hear the echo of the Kierkegaardian assertion of the single individual against the abstractions of Hegelian philosophy, or similarly Sartre’s insistence on the necessity of the prioritization of the personal lives of self-creating people (what Sartre calls ‘existence’) as opposed to a pre-established ideal of what humans should be like (what Sartre calls ‘essence’). The Second Sex is an exemplary text showing how a philosophical movement can have real, tangible effects on the lives of many people, and is a magnificent exercise in what philosophy could be.

“I hesitated a long time before writing a book on woman. The subject is irritating, especially for women...” (Beauvoir 2009:3). The Second Sex begins with the most obvious (but rarely posed) question: What is woman? De Beauvoir finds that at present there is no answer to that question. The reason is that tradition has always thought of woman as the other of man. It is only man that constitutes himself as a subject (as the Absolute de Beauvoir says), and woman defines herself only through him. “She determines and differentiates herself in relation to man, and he does not in relation to her; she is the inessential in front of the essential...” (Beauvoir 2009:6). But why is it that woman has initially accepted or tolerated this process whereby she becomes the other of man? De Beauvoir does not give a consoling answer; on the contrary, by turning to Sartre’s notion of bad faith (which refers to the human being’s anxiety in front of the responsibility entailed by the realization of its radical freedom) she thinks that women at times are complicit to their situation. It is indeed easier for one – anyone – to assume the role of an object (for example a housewife 'kept' by her husband) than to take responsibility for creating him or herself and creating the possibilities of freedom for others. Naturally the condition of bad faith is not always the case. Often women found themselves in a sociocultural environment which denied them the very possibility of personal flourishing (as happens with most of the major religious communities). A further problem that women face is that of understanding themselves as a unity which would enable them to assume the role of their choosing. “Proletarians say ‘we’. So do blacks” (Beauvoir 2009:8). By saying ‘we’ they assume the role of the subject and turn everyone else into ‘other’. Women are unable to utter this ‘we’. “They live dispersed among men, tied by homes, work, economic interests and social conditions to certain men – fathers or husbands – more closely than to other women. As bourgeois women, they are in solidarity with bourgeois men and not with women proletarians; as white women, they are in solidarity with white men and not with black women” (Beauvoir 2009:9). Women primarily align themselves to their class or race and not to other women. The female identity is “very much bound up with the identity of the men around them...” (Reynolds 2006:145).

One of the most celebrated moments in The Second Sex is the much quoted phrase: “One is not born, but rather becomes, woman” (Beauvoir 2009:293). She explains: “No biological, physical or economic destiny defines the figure that the human female takes on in society; it is civilization as a whole that elaborates this intermediary product between the male and the eunuch that is called feminine” (Beauvoir 2009:293). For some feminists this clearly inaugurates the problematic of the sex-gender distinction (where sex denotes the biological identity of the person and gender the cultural attribution of properties to the sexed body). Simply put, there is absolutely nothing that determines the ‘assumed’ femininity of the woman (how a woman acts, feels, behaves) – everything that we have come to think as ‘feminine’ is a social construction not a natural given. Later feminists like Monique Wittig and Judith Butler will argue that ‘sex’ is already ‘gender’ in the sense that a sexed body exists always already within a cultural nexus that defines it. Thus the sex assignment (a doctor pronouncing the sex of the baby) is a naturalized (but not at all natural) normative claim which delivers the human into a world of power relations.

f. Albert Camus (1913-1960) as an Existentialist Philosopher

Albert Camus was a French intellectual, writer and journalist. His multifaceted work as well as his ambivalent relation to both philosophy and existentialism makes every attempt to classify him a rather risky operation. A recipient of the 1957 Nobel Prize for Literature primarily for his novels, he is also known as a philosopher due to his non-literary work and his relation with Jean-Paul Sartre. And yet his response was clear: “I am not a philosopher, because I don’t believe in reason enough to believe in a system. What interests me is knowing how we must behave, and more precisely, how to behave when one does not believe in God or reason” (Camus in Sherman 2009: 1). The issue is not just about the label 'existentialist'. It rather points to a deep tension within the current of thought of all thinkers associated with existentialism. The question is: With how many voices can thought speak? As we have already seen, the thinkers of existentialism often deployed more than one. Almost all of them share a deep suspicion to a philosophy operating within reason as conceived of by the Enlightenment. Camus shares this suspicion and his so called philosophy of the absurd intends to set limits to the overambitions of Western rationality. Reason is absurd in that it believes that it can explain the totality of the human experience whereas it is exactly its inability for explanation that, for example, a moment of fall designates. Thus in his novel “The Fall” the protagonist’s tumultuous narrative reveals the overtaking of a life of superficial regularity by the forces of darkness and irrationality. “A bourgeois hell, inhabited of course by bad dreams” (Camus 2006:10). In a similar fashion Camus has also repudiated his connection with existentialism. “Non, je ne suis pas existentialist” is the title of a famous interview that he gave for the magazine Les Nouvelles Littéraires on the 15 of November, 1945. The truth of the matter is that Camus’ rejection of existentialism is directed more toward Sartre’s version of it rather than toward a dismissal of the main problems that the existential thinkers faced. Particularly, Camus was worried that Sartre’s deification of history (Sartre’s proclaimed Marxism) would be incompatible with the affirmation of personal freedom. Camus accuses Hegel (subsequently Marx himself) of reducing man to history and thus denying man the possibility of creating his own history, that is, affirming his freedom.

Philosophically, Camus is known for his conception of the absurd. Perhaps we should clarify from the very beginning what the absurd is not. The absurd is not nihilism. For Camus the acceptance of the absurd does not lead to nihilism (according to Nietzsche nihilism denotes the state in which the highest values devalue themselves) or to inertia, but rather to their opposite: to action and participation. The notion of the absurd signifies the space which opens up between, on the one hand, man’s need for intelligibility and, on the other hand, 'the unreasonable silence of the world' as he beautifully puts it. In a world devoid of God, eternal truths or any other guiding principle, how could man bear the responsibility of a meaning-giving activity? The absurd man, like an astronaut looking at the earth from above, wonders whether a philosophical system, a religion or a political ideology is able to make the world respond to the questioning of man, or rather whether all human constructions are nothing but the excessive face-paint of a clown which is there to cover his sadness. This terrible suspicion haunts the absurd man. In one of the most memorable openings of a non-fictional book he states: “There is but one truly serious philosophical problem and that is suicide. Judging whether life is or is not worth living amounts to answering the fundamental question of philosophy. All the rest – whether or not the world has three dimensions, whether the mind has nine or twelve categories – comes afterwards. These are games; one must first answer” (Camus 2000:11). The problem of suicide (a deeply personal problem) manifests the exigency of a meaning-giving response. Indeed for Camus a suicidal response to the problem of meaning would be the confirmation that the absurd has taken over man’s inner life. It would mean that man is not any more an animal going after answers, in accordance with some inner drive that leads him to act in order to endow the world with meaning. The suicide has become but a passive recipient of the muteness of the world. “...The absurd ... is simultaneously awareness and rejection of death” (Camus 2000:54). One has to be aware of death – because it is precisely the realization of man’s mortality that pushes someone to strive for answers – and one has ultimately to reject death – that is, reject suicide as well as the living death of inertia and inaction. At the end one has to keep the absurd alive, as Camus says. But what does it that mean?

In The Myth of Sisyphus Camus tells the story of the mythical Sisyphus who was condemned by the Gods to ceaselessly roll a rock to the top of a mountain and then have to let it fall back again of its own weight. “Sisyphus, proletarian of the gods, powerless and rebellious, knows the whole extent of his wretched condition: it is what he thinks of during his descent. The lucidity that was to constitute his torture at the same time crowns his victory. There is no fate that cannot be surmounted by scorn” (Camus 2000:109). One must imagine then Sisyphus victorious: fate and absurdity have been overcome by a joyful contempt. Scorn is the appropriate response in the face of the absurd; another name for this 'scorn' though would be artistic creation. When Camus says: “One does not discover the absurd without being tempted to write a manual of happiness” (Camus 2000:110) he writes about a moment of exhilarated madness, which is the moment of the genesis of the artistic work. Madness, but nevertheless profound – think of the function of the Fool in Shakespeare’s King Lear as the one who reveals to the king the most profound truths through play, mimicry and songs. Such madness can overcome the absurd without cancelling it altogether.

Almost ten years after the publication of The Myth of Sisyphus Camus publishes his second major philosophical work, The Rebel (1951). Camus continues the problematic which had begun with The Myth of Sisyphus. Previously, revolt or creation had been considered the necessary response to the absurdity of existence. Here, Camus goes on to examine the nature of rebellion and its multiple manifestations in history. In The Myth of Sisyphus, in truly Nietzschean fashion, Camus had said: “There is but one useful action, that of remaking man and the earth” (Camus 2000:31). However, in The Rebel, reminiscent of Orwell’s Animal Farm, one of the first points he makes is the following: “The slave starts by begging for justice and ends by wanting to wear a crown. He too wants to dominate” (Camus 2000b:31). The problem is that while man genuinely rebels against both unfair social conditions and, as Camus says, against the whole of creation, nevertheless in the practical administration of such revolution, man comes to deny the humanity of the other in an attempt to impose his own individuality. Take for example the case of the infamous Marquis de Sade which Camus explores. In Sade, contradictory forces are at work (see The 120 Days of Sodom). On the one hand, Sade wishes the establishment of a (certainly mad) community with desire as the ultimate master, and on the other hand this very desire consumes itself and all the subjects who stand in its way.

Camus goes on to examine historical manifestations of rebellion, the most prominent case being that of the French Revolution. Camus argues that the revolution ended up taking the place of the transcendent values which it sought to abolish. An all-powerful notion of justice now takes the place formerly inhabited by God. Rousseau’s infamous suggestion that under the rule of ‘general will’ everyone would be 'forced to be free' (Rousseau in Foley 2008:61) opens the way to the crimes committed after the revolution. Camus fears that all revolutions end with the re-establishment of the State. “...Seventeen eighty-nine brings Napoleon; 1848 Napoleon III; 1917 Stalin; the Italian disturbances of the twenties, Mussolini; the Weimar Republic, Hitler” (Camus 2000b:146). Camus is led to examine the Marxist view of history as a possible response to the failed attempts at the establishment of a true revolutionary regime. Camus examines the similarities between the Christian and the Marxist conception of history. They both exhibit a bourgeois preoccupation with progress. In the name of the future everything can be justified: “the future is the only kind of property that the masters willingly concede to the slaves” (Camus 2000b:162). History according to both views is the linear progress from a set beginning to a definite end (the metaphysical salvation of man or the materialistic salvation of him in the future Communist society). Influenced by Kojève’s reading of Hegel, Camus interprets this future, classless society as the ‘end of history’. The ‘end of history’ suggests that when all contradictions cease then history itself will come to an end. This is, Camus argues, essentially nihilistic: history, in effect, accepts that meaning creation is no longer possible and commits suicide. Because historical revolutions are for the most part nihilistic movements, Camus suggests that it is the making-absolute of the values of the revolution that necessarily lead to their negation. On the contrary a relative conception of these values will be able to sustain a community of free individuals who have not forgotten that every historical rebellion has begun by affirming a proto-value (that of human solidarity) upon which every other value can be based.

3. The Influence of Existentialism

a. The Arts and Psychology

In the field of visual arts existentialism exercised an enormous influence, most obviously on the movement of Expressionism. Expressionism began in Germany at the beginning of the 20th century. With its emphasis on subjective experience, Angst and intense emotionality, German expressionism sought to go beyond the naiveté of realist representation and to deal with the anguish of the modern man (exemplified in the terrible experiences of WWI). Many of the artists of Expressionism read Nietzsche intensively and following Nietzsche’s suggestion for a transvaluation of values experimented with alternative lifestyles. Erich Heckel’s woodcut “Friedrich Nietzsche” from 1905 is a powerful reminder of the movement’s connection to Existentialist thought. Abstract expressionism (which included artists such as de Kooning and Pollock, and theorists such as Rosenberg) continued with some of the same themes in the United States from the 1940s and tended to embrace existentialism as one of its intellectual guides, especially after Sartre's US lecture tour in 1946 and a production of No Exit in New York.

German Expressionism was particularly important during the birth of the new art of cinema. Perhaps the closest cinematic work to Existentialist concerns remains F.W. Murnau’s The Last Laugh (1924) in which the constantly moving camera (which prefigures the ‘rule’ of the hand-held camera of the Danish Dogma 95) attempts to arrest the spiritual anguish of a man who suddenly finds himself in a meaningless world. Expressionism became a world-wide style within cinema, especially as film directors like Lang fled Germany and ended up in Hollywood. Jean Genet's Un chant d'amour (1950) is a moving poetic exploration of desire. In the sordid, claustrophobic cells of a prison the inmates’ craving for intimacy takes place against the background of an unavoidable despair for existence itself. European directors such as Bergman and Godard are often associated with existentialist themes. Godard's Vivre sa vie (My Life to Live, 1962) is explicit in its exploration of the nature of freedom under conditions of extreme social and personal pressure. In the late 20th and early 21st centuries existentialist ideas became common in mainstream cinema, pervading the work of writers and directors such as Woody Allen, Richard Linklater, Charlie Kaufman and Christopher Nolan.

Given that Sartre and Camus were both prominent novelists and playwrights, the influence of existentialism on literature is not surprising. However, the influence was also the other way. Novelists such as Dostoevsky or Kafka, and the dramatist Ibsen, were often cited by mid-century existentialists as important precedents, right along with Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Dostoevsky creates a character Ivan Karamazov (in The Brothers Karamazov, 1880) who holds the view that if God is dead, then everything is permitted; both Nietzsche and Sartre discuss Dostoevsky with enthusiasm. Within drama, the theatre of the absurd and most obviously Beckett were influenced by existentialist ideas; later playwrights such as Albee, Pinter and Stoppard continue this tradition.

One of the key figures of 20th century psychology, Sigmund Freud, was indebted to Nietzsche especially for his analysis of the role of psychology within culture and history, and for his view of cultural artefacts such as drama or music as 'unconscious' documentations of psychological tensions. But a more explicit taking up of existentialist themes is found in the broad 'existentialist psychotherapy' movement. A common theme within this otherwise very diverse group is that previous psychology misunderstood the fundamental nature of the human and especially its relation to others and to acts of meaning-giving; thus also, previous psychology had misunderstood what a 'healthy' attitude to self, others and meaning might be.  Key figures here include Swiss psychologists Ludwig Binswanger and later Menard Boss, both of who were enthusiastic readers of Heidegger; the Austrian Frankl, who invented the method of logotherapy; in England, Laing and Cooper, who were explicitly influenced by Sartre; and in the United States, Rollo May, who stresses the ineradicable importance of anxiety.

b. Philosophy

As a whole, existentialism has had relatively little direct influence within philosophy. In Germany, existentialism (and especially Heidegger) was criticised for being obscure, abstract or even mystical in nature. This criticism was made especially by Adorno in The Jargon of Authenticity, and in Dog Years, novelist Gunter Grass gives a Voltaire-like, savage satire of Heidegger. The criticism was echoed by many in the analytic tradition. Heidegger and the existentialist were also taken to task for paying insufficient attention to social and political structures or values, with dangerous results. In France, philosophers like Sartre were criticised by those newly under the influence of structuralism for paying insufficient attention to the nature of language and to impersonal structures of meaning. In short, philosophy moved on, and in different directions. Individual philosophers remain influential, however: Nietzsche and Heidegger in particular are very much 'live' topics in philosophy, even in the 21st century.

However, there are some less direct influences that remain important. Let us raise three examples. Both the issue of freedom in relation to situation, and that of the philosophical significance of what otherwise might appear to be extraneous contextual factors, remain key, albeit in dramatically altered formulation, within the work of Michel Foucault or Alain Badiou, two figures central to late 20th century European thought. Likewise, the philosophical importance that the existentialists placed upon emotion has been influential, legitimising a whole domain of philosophical research even by philosophers who have no interest in existentialism. Similarly, existentialism was a philosophy that insisted philosophy could and should deal very directly with 'real world' topics such as sex, death or crime, topics that had most frequently been approached abstractly within the philosophical tradition. Mary Warnock wrote on existentialism and especially Sartre, for example, while also having an incredibly important and public role within recent applied ethics.

4. References and Further Reading

a. General Introductions

  • Warnock Mary. Existentialism (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1970)
  • Barrett William. Irrational Man: A Study in Existential Philosophy (New York: Anchor House, 1990)
  • Cooper E. David. Existentialism (Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 1999)
  • Reynolds Jack. Understanding Existentialism (Stocksfield: Acumen, 2006)
  • Earnshaw Steven. Existentialism: A Guide for the Perplexed (London: Continuum, 2006)

b. Anthologies

  • Kauffman Walter.  Existentialism from Dostoevsky to Sartre (New York: Penguin, 1975)
  • Paul S. MacDonald. The Existentialist Reader An Anthology of Key Texts (Edinburgh: Edinburg University Press, 2000)
  • Solomon C. Robert. Existentialism (USA: Oxford University Press, 2004)

c. Primary Bibliography

  • Beauvoir de Simone. The Ethics of Ambiguity (New York: Citadel Press, 1976)
  • Beauvoir de Simone. The Second Sex (London: Jonathan Cape, 2009)
  • Camus Albert. The Myth of Sisyphus (London: Penguin, 2000)
  • Camus Albert. The Rebel (London: Penguin, 2000b)
  • Camus Albert.  The Fall, (London: Penguin, 2006)
  • Heidegger Martin, Introduction to Metaphysics (New Heaven & London: Yale University Press,2000)
  • Heidegger Martin. Letter on Humanism: in Heidegger Martin. Basic Writings, (London: Routledge, 1993)
  • Heidegger Martin. Being and Time (Oxford: Blackwell, 1962)
  • Heidegger Martin. Identity and Difference (Chicago: Chicago University Press, 2002)
  • Kierkegaard Søren. The Concept of Anxiety (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1980)
  • Kierkegaard Søren. Fear and Trembling (New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 1983)
  • Kierkegaard Søren. Papers and Journals: A Selection, (London: Penguin Book, 1996)
  • Nietzsche Friedrich. Ecce Homo (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007)
  • Nietzsche Friedrich. The Gay Science (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001)
  • Nietzsche Friedrich. Twilight of the Idols (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008)
  • Nietzsche Friedrich. On the Genealogy of Morality (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007)
  • Sartre Jean-Paul. Being and Nothingness (London and New York: Routledge, 2003)
  • Sartre Jean-Paul, "Intentionality: A fundamental idea of Husserl's Phenomenology." Trans. by Joseph P. Fell, Journal of the British Society for Phenomenology, 1970, Vol. 1, No. 2

d. Secondary Bibliography

  • Camus
  • Todd Oliver. Albert Camus A Life (London: Vintage, 1998)
  • Sherman David. Camus (Oxford: Blackwell, 2009)
  • Foley John. Albert Camus From the Absurd to Revolt (Stocksfield: Accumen, 2009)
  • Sartre
  • Cox Gary. Sartre A guide for the Perplexed (London: Continuum, 2006)
  • Gardner Sebastian. Sartres Being and Nothingness (London: Continuum, 2009)
  • Stewart John, “Merleau-Ponty’s criticisms of Sartre’s theory of freedom. Philosophy Today, 39:3 (1995:Fall)
  • Heidegger
  • Beistegui de Miguel. The New Heidegger (London & New York: Continuum, 2005)
  • Marx Werner. Heidegger and the Tradition (Evanson: Northwestern University Press, 1971)
  • Polt Richard. Heidegger An Inroduction (London: UCL Press, 1999)
  • Safranski Rüdiger. Martin Heidegger: Between Good and Evil (Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1999)
  • Watts Michael. The philosophy of Heidegger (Durham: Acumen, 2011)
  • Nietzsche
  • Ansell-Pearson Keith. An Introduction to Nietzsche as Political Thinker (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994)
  • Burnham Douglas. Reading Nietzsche An Analysis of Beyond Good an Evil (Stocksfield: Accumen, 2007)
  • Burnham Douglas and Jesinghausen Martin. Nietzsches Thus Spoke Zarathustra (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2010)
  • Burnham Douglas and Jesinghausen Martin. Nietzsches The Birth of Tragedy (London: Continuum, 2010)
  • Safranski Rüdiger. Nietzsche - A Philosophical Biography (London: Granta Books, 2002)
  • Kierkegaard
  • Pattison George. The Philosophy of Kierkegaard (Chesham: Acumen, 2005)
  • Weston Michael. Kierkegaard and Modern Continental Philosophy: An Introduction (London: Routledge, 1994)

e. Other Works Cited

  • Hegel G.W.F. Phenomenology of Spirit, (Oxford and New York, Oxford University Press, 1977)
  • Spinoza Baruch Ethics in: Spinoza Baruch Complete Works, (Indianapolis, Hackett Publishing, 2002)
  • Kant Immanuel An Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment? in Kant Immanuel Political Writings, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991)


Author Information

Douglas Burnham
Staffordshire University
United Kingdom


George Papandreopoulos
Staffordshire University
United Kingdom

Epistemic Luck

Epistemic luck is a generic notion used to describe any of a number of ways in which it can be accidental, coincidental, or fortuitous that a person has a true belief. For example, one can form a true belief as a result of a lucky guess, as when one believes through guesswork that “C” is the right answer to a multiple-choice question and one’s belief just happens to be correct. One can form a true belief via wishful thinking; for example, an optimist’s belief that it will not rain may luckily turn out to be correct, despite forecasts for heavy rain all day. One can reason from false premises to a belief that coincidentally happens to be true. One can accidentally arrive at a true belief through invalid or fallacious reasoning. And one can fortuitously arrive at a true belief from testimony that was intended to mislead but unwittingly reported the truth. In all of these cases, it is just a matter of luck that the person has a true belief.

Until the twenty-first century, there was nearly universal agreement among epistemologists that epistemic luck is incompatible with knowledge. Call this view “the incompatibility thesis.” In light of the incompatibility thesis, epistemic luck presents epistemologists with three distinct but related challenges. The first is that of providing an accurate analysis of knowledge (in terms of individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for “S knows that p,” where ‘S’ represents the knower and ‘p’ represents the proposition known). An adequate analysis of knowledge must succeed in specifying conditions that rule out all instances of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck. The second challenge is to resolve the skeptical paradox that the ubiquity of epistemic luck generates: As will become clear in section 2c, epistemic luck is an all-pervasive phenomenon. Coupling this fact with the incompatibility thesis entails that we have no propositional knowledge. The non-skeptical epistemologist must somehow reconcile the strong intuition that epistemic luck is not compatible with knowledge with the equally evident observation that it must be. The third challenge concerns the special skeptical threat that epistemic luck seems to pose for more reflective forms of knowledge, such as knowing that one knows. Each of these challenges will be explored in the present article.

Table of Contents

  1. Epistemic Luck and the Analysis of Knowledge
    1. The Incompatibility Thesis
    2. The Justified-True-Belief Analysis of Knowledge
    3. The Gettier Problem
    4. Purported Solutions to the Gettier Problem
      1. No False Grounds
      2. No Essential False Grounds
      3. Defeasibility Approaches
      4. The Externalist Turn
      5. The Causal Theory of Knowing
    5. Controversial Cases
      1. Beneficial Falsehoods
      2. Misleading Evidence One Does Not Possess
      3. Impact of These Cases
    6. Where Things Stand
  2. The Paradox of Epistemic Luck
    1. The Knowledge Thesis
    2. The Incompatibility Thesis (Again)
    3. The Ubiquity Thesis
    4. The Skeptical Challenge
    5. Rejecting the Incompatibility Thesis
    6. Knowledge-Destroying Epistemic Luck
      1. Evidential vs. Veritic Luck
      2. Justification-Oriented Luck
      3. Modal Veritic Luck
    7. Second-Wave Anti-Luck Epistemologies
      1. Sensitivity
      2. Safety
    8. Paradox Lost
  3. Epistemic Luck and Knowing that One Knows
    1. Internalism, Epistemic Luck, and the Problem of Knowing that One Knows
    2. Epistemic Luck and Reflective Knowledge
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Epistemic Luck and the Analysis of Knowledge

There is no settled agreement as to how best to characterize the accidentality or fortuitousness of an epistemically lucky true belief. Some have attempted to cash out the accidentality of epistemically lucky beliefs modally. For example, Mark Heller (1999) contends that person S’s belief that p is epistemically lucky (and hence not knowledge) if p is true in the actual world, but there is at least one world, in a contextually-determined set of possible worlds, where S’s belief that p is false. On Duncan Pritchard’s modal characterization (2005), S’s belief is epistemically lucky if it is true in the actual world, but false in a majority of nearby possible worlds where S forms the belief in the same way. Others (Riggs 2007; Coffman 2007) insist that epistemic luck be cashed out in terms of a lack of control condition. Each of these proposals has been criticized in the literature. Despite the lack of agreement concerning the exact nature of epistemic luck, there is widespread agreement that epistemic luck is incompatible with knowledge.

One of the earliest recorded illustrations of knowledge-destroying luck can be found in Plato’s Theaetetus. In this dialogue, Socrates inquires as to what knowledge is. When Theaetetus suggests that knowledge is true belief, Socrates quickly convinces him that he is mistaken by noting that a jury may luckily arrive at a true belief either as a result of the rhetorical skill of a jurist intent on getting a certain verdict or on the basis of unsubstantiated hearsay, and in either case, the lucky true belief would fall short of knowledge. The Socratic challenge posed in the Theaetetus is to specify what must be added to true belief to get knowledge. To meet that challenge, one must provide an analysis of knowledge that correctly identifies the conditions that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for S to know that p (where ‘S’ represents the knower and ‘p’ represents the proposition known). As will become readily apparent in what follows, the possibility of epistemic luck makes the already difficult task of meeting the Socratic challenge all the more difficult.

a. The Incompatibility Thesis

Epistemologists have long agreed with Plato that epistemic luck is incompatible with knowledge. To see just how widespread commitment to the incompatibility thesis is, consider the remarks of just few representative epistemologists. In The Problems of Philosophy (1912, p. 131), Bertrand Russell asks the question: “Can we ever know anything at all, or do we merely sometimes by good luck believe what is true?”—the implication being that lucky true belief is not knowledge. In Theory of Knowledge (1990, p. 12), Keith Lehrer stresses that knowledge requires more than lucky true acceptance: “If I accept something without evidence or justification . . . and, as luck would have it, this turns out to be right, I fall short of knowing that what I have accepted is true.” In Reasons and Knowledge (1981, p. 31), Marshall Swain maintains that: “lucky guesses do not constitute factual knowledge.” In his Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy article on the analysis of knowledge (2006), Matthias Steup expressly endorses the incompatibility thesis: “Let us refer to a belief's turning out to be true because of mere luck as epistemic luck. It is uncontroversial that knowledge is incompatible with epistemic luck.” In his Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy article on epistemology (2007), David Truncellito concurs: “a lucky guess cannot constitute knowledge. Similarly, misinformation and faulty reasoning do not seem like a recipe for knowledge, even if they happen to lead to a true belief.” In Epistemic Luck (2005, p. 1), Duncan Pritchard calls attention to “the seemingly universal intuition that knowledge excludes luck, or, to put it another way, that the epistemic luck that sometimes enables one to have true beliefs . . . is incompatible with knowledge.”

The nearly universal intuition that epistemic luck is incompatible with knowledge is rooted in compelling examples like the following:

Jack of Hearts

Dylan is an avid euchre player. One night between hands, the dealer asks Dylan which card he believes to be on the top of the freshly shuffled euchre deck. Dylan thinks for a moment and, recalling his fondness of bowers, comes to believe that the top card is the jack of hearts. After Dylan reports his belief, the dealer turns over the top card, which just so happens to be the jack of hearts.

Since the probability of the jack of hearts being the top card of a randomly shuffled euchre deck is 1/32, it is just a matter of luck that Dylan’s belief was true. Dylan certainly didn’t know that the jack of hearts was the top card. He just happened to guess correctly, and knowledge requires more than lucky guesswork.

b. The Justified-True-Belief Analysis of Knowledge

Examples like Jack of Hearts clearly show that true belief is not sufficient for knowledge. What, then, must be added to true belief in order to get knowledge? Prior to 1963, most epistemologists maintained that justification is what is required to convert true belief to knowledge, and as a result, they endorsed the justified-true-belief analysis of knowledge:

(JTB)   For any subject S and any proposition p, S knows that p if and only if:

(i) p is true,

(ii) S believes that p [Bp], and

(iii) S is justified in believing that p [Jp].

Fallibilists and infallibilists disagree about the kind of justification required by (iii). Infallibilists maintain that knowledge requires infallible justification. Infallible justification entails the truth of the proposition for which it is justification. Fallibilists, on the other hand, endorse a weaker justification requirement. They contend that the kind of justification requisite for knowledge need only render probable, but need not entail, that for which it is justification.

At first blush, it might look as if infallible justification holds the key to eliminating epistemic luck and is, thus, the kind of justification needed for knowledge. After all, if S believes that p on the basis of infallible truth-entailing justification for p, it is impossible for S to be mistaken with respect to p. Unfortunately, the legacy of infallibilism is nearly wholesale skepticism. The point can be demonstrated as follows: Since our evidence for the non-cogito contingent empirical propositions we believe never entails the truth of those propositions, it follows that if the kind of justification required for knowledge is infallible truth-entailing justification, then we are never justified in believing, and hence never know, that such propositions are true. An infallibilist justification requirement would go a long way toward eliminating epistemic luck, but it would do so at the cost of making empirical knowledge impossible—hardly an adequate non-skeptical solution to the problem of epistemic luck.

Recognizing the skeptical implications of infallibilism, most contemporary epistemologists have embraced fallibilism so that empirical knowledge remains at least in principle possible. Fallibilistic justification is thought to rule out epistemic luck by making one’s belief extremely probable. When one’s belief that p is extremely probable, it is not just a matter of luck that one’s belief is true. Recall Jack of Hearts. Prior to the dealer’s turning over the top card, Dylan has no evidence as to what the top card is. As such, it is extremely improbable that the top card is the jack of hearts. Consider how Dylan’s epistemic situation changes after the dealer turns over the top card, and Dylan sees the jack of hearts. Now Dylan has good perceptual evidence that the card is the jack of hearts. Given his newly-acquired perceptual evidence, it is now extremely probable that the card is the jack of hearts, and as a result, it is no longer just a matter of luck that his belief that it is the jack of hearts is true. Granted, it is possible that a Cartesian evil demon could have caused Dylan to hallucinate the jack of hearts right as the dealer flipped over some other card (which illustrates that Dylan’s perceptual evidence doesn’t entail that the card is the jack of hearts), and so, his evidence doesn’t eliminate all chance of error; but it does make the chance of error extremely low, and when error is extremely improbable, it is not simply a matter of luck that one’s belief is true.

c. The Gettier Problem

Although the role of the justification condition in the JTB-analysis is to rule out lucky guesses as instances of knowledge, it remains possible, given any fallibilistic account of justification, to have a justified belief that is only luckily true, a fact that went largely unnoticed until the publication of Edmund Gettier’s seminal article “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” (1963). Therein, Gettier provides two compelling counterexamples to the JTB-analysis of knowledge. He dubs these examples “Case I” and “Case II.” Both cases involve a person who justifiably comes to believe a true proposition by validly deducing it from a justified-but-false belief. Consider first Gettier’s Case II.

Case II: Smith has good evidence for believing that Jones owns a Ford [J]. Indeed, Smith’s evidence for thinking that Jones owns a Ford is at least as strong as the evidence that we typically have for thinking that our friends and family members own the cars they do. Smith’s evidence consists of the following: As far back as Smith can remember, Jones has always owned a Ford; just that morning, Jones gave Smith a ride while driving a Ford; and Smith was with Jones a few months back when Jones purchased a Ford exactly like the one she was driving when she offered Smith the ride earlier that morning. Based on this evidence, Smith justifiedly believes that Jones owns a Ford [J]. On the basis of her justified belief that J, Smith justifiedly deduces and comes to believe the disjunction that either Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Barcelona [J or B], despite having no idea of Brown’s whereabouts. As it turns out, Jones no longer owns a Ford. She recently sold her Ford and is driving a rental. However, purely by coincidence, Brown happens to be in Barcelona. Obviously, it is just a matter of luck that Smith’s justified belief that J or B is true. Nearly every epistemologist who has considered this case agrees that Smith’s luck-infused justified-true-belief that J or B falls short of knowledge.

Here is a slightly modified version Gettier’s other example. Case I: While waiting for a job interview, Smith sees Nelson take the coins out of her pocket, count them (ten coins in all), and then put them back in her pocket. Smith also overhears the boss on the phone telling someone that Nelson is the person who will get the job. On the basis of this evidence, Smith justifiedly believes the conjunction:

(N)  Nelson will get the job, and Nelson has ten coins in her pocket.

On basis of her justified belief that N, Smith deduces and justifiedly comes to believe:

(P)  The person who will get the job has ten coins in her pocket.

Despite Smith’s evidence, N is false. The boss misspoke on the phone. Actually, it is Smith, not Nelson, who will get the job, and purely by chance, Smith happens to have exactly ten coins in her pocket. Once again, it is just a matter of luck that Smith’s belief—this time her belief that P—is true. With these two examples, Gettier showed that fallibilistic justification is incapable of eliminating all forms of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck and that, as a result, justified true belief is not sufficient for knowledge.

d. Purported Solutions to the Gettier Problem

Gettier’s paper gave rise to a plethora of articles attempting to solve the problem that now bears his name. Many of these purported solutions sought to resolve the problem by supplementing the JTB-analysis with a fourth condition, while others abandoned the JTB-analysis in favor of non-traditional ajustificational accounts of knowledge. Consider first some of the prominent fourth condition responses.

i. No False Grounds

In both of Gettier’s examples, Smith justifiably infers a true belief from a justified-but-false belief, and it has seemed to many that a true belief is not knowledge when it is deduced from a false belief. As a result, a number of epistemologists sought to resolve the Gettier problem by supplementing JTB with a “No False Grounds” clause along the following lines:

(NFG) S knows that p if and only if (i) p is true, (ii) S believes that p, (iii) S is justified in believing that p, and (iv) S’s justification for p does not rest on any false beliefs.

An analysis of knowledge can be too strong or too weak: It is too strong if it is possible for a person to know that p without satisfying all of the conditions spelled out in the analysis. It is too weak if one can fail to know that p when all the conditions in the analysis have been met. To see that NFG is too strong, we need only modify Gettier’s Case II as follows:


Smith is sitting in a café in Barcelona with Brown having a cup of espresso. While there, with Brown, Smith justifiably infers and comes to believe that J or B on the basis of her justified-but-false belief that Jones owns a Ford [J] and on the basis of her justified-true-belief that Brown is Barcelona [B].

In this scenario, Smith has excellent evidence for B along with her misleading evidence for J. Since Smith knows B is true and validly deduces J or B from her knowledge that B, it is not at all lucky that her justified belief that J or B is true; and so, Smith knows that J or B, despite the fact that part of her evidence, namely, J, is false. Hence, NFG is false, for it entails that a person fails to know that p whenever any part (even a dispensable and thus superfluous part) of her justification is false, when, intuitively, a person with some false evidence for p can still know that p provided she has at least one independent chain of all-true-evidence justification for p.

ii. No Essential False Grounds

In Gettier’s Case II (where Smith clearly fails to know that J or B), Smith’s justification for J or B essentially depends on Smith’s justified-but-false belief that J. In Café (where intuitively Smith does know that J or B), Smith has two independent strands of justification for J or B. The first strand is her justified-but-false belief that J. The second strand is her justified-true-belief that B. As a result, Smith could dispense with the first strand entirely and still be justified in believing the disjunction J or B. Our markedly different appraisals of Smith’s epistemic status vis-à-vis J or B in these two cases suggest that the presence of false grounds precludes the knowledge that p only when those grounds play an indispensable role in a person’s justification for p. Given this insight, it might seem that the no false grounds condition in NFG should be replaced with a no essential false grounds condition as follows:

(NEFG)  S knows that p if and only if (i) p is true, (ii) S believes that p, (iii) S is justified in believing that p, and (iv) S’s justification for p does not essentially depend on any false beliefs.

Unfortunately, NEFG is too weak because there can be all-true-evidence Gettier cases—cases where the person’s justification for her lucky true belief does not depend on any false beliefs. An example of an all-true-evidence Gettier case is provided by Brian Skyrms’s (1967) case involving Sure-Fire matches:


Pete knows that Sure-Fire matches have always lit in the past when struck. Pete also knows that the match he is holding is a Sure-Fire match. Based on this evidence, which he knows to be true, Pete justifiably believes that the match he is holding will light when struck [L]. Unbeknownst to Pete, the match he is holding is a defective Sure-Fire match (the first ever!) with impurities that raise its combustion temperature above that which can be produced by striking friction. As luck would have it, just as Pete strikes the match, a sudden burst of Q-radiation ignites the match.

In Pyromaniac, Pete has a justified true belief that L, which is based entirely on true evidence that Pete knows, and yet, it is still just a matter of luck that his belief is true. This example shows that one can have a lucky true belief that p that falls short of knowledge, even when all of one’s evidence for p is true. Thus, NEFG is too weak. There are genuine Gettier cases that it fails to rule out.

iii. Defeasibility Approaches

In each of Gettier’s original cases, there is a true proposition unbeknownst to Smith such that were that proposition added to the rest of Smith’s evidence, Smith would no longer be justified in believing the Gettiered belief. Call such a proposition a defeater. In Case I, the defeater is the true proposition that Nelson will not get the job [~N]. If ~N were added to Smith’s evidence, Smith would not be justified in believing that the person who will get the job has ten coins in her pocket, for she would no longer have any idea who will get the job. In Case II, the defeater is the true proposition that Jones does not own a Ford [~J]. Since Smith has no knowledge as to Brown’s whereabouts, if ~J were added to Smith’s evidence, she would no longer be justified in believing that J or B. Notice, however, that in the case of Café (where Smith is with Brown in Barcelona), the true proposition ~J is not a defeater, because adding ~J to Smith’s evidence in Café would not prevent Smith from being justified in believing that J or B. Smith would still be justified in believing J or B on the basis of her justified true belief that B.

Defeasibility theorists contend that a person fails to know that p whenever there is a defeater for her justification for p. Their proposal for solving the Gettier problem is to supplement the JTB-analysis with a No Defeaters condition as follows:

(ND)    S knows that p if and only if (i) p is true, (ii) S believes that p, (iii) S is justified in believing that p, and (iv) there are no defeaters for S’s justification for p.

The biggest problem facing the No Defeaters approach is that there is no agreement among defeasibility theorists themselves as to the correct account of defeaters. For example, Roderick Chisholm (1964) and Peter Klein (1971) have characterized defeaters as follows:

(D1)     When evidence e justifies S in believing that p, then proposition d is a defeater for S’s justification if and only if (i) d is true and (ii) the conjunction of d and e does not justify S in believing that p.

Keith Lehrer and Thomas Paxson Jr. (1969) contend that D1 is too weak, as a definition of defeaters, because it counts as defeaters certain statements that intuitively are not defeaters. They offer the following case in point:


While at the library, I see a student of mine, Tom Grabit, take a book from the shelf, conceal it under his coat, and leave the library without checking it out. I know Tom Grabit well, and I am sure that he stole the book. I justifiedly believe that Tom Grabit stole the book, and he did.

Intuitively, I know that Tom Grabit stole the book. But here’s the rub: Unbeknownst to me, Tom Grabit’s mother said that on the day in question Tom was not in the library, indeed, he was thousands of miles away, and that Tom’s identical twin, John Grabit, was in the library. On the D1 account of defeaters, the following true proposition is a defeater for my justification for thinking that Tom stole the book:

(M) Tom’s mother said that Tom was not in the library at the time of the theft, but his identical twin John was.

If M were added to my evidence, I would no longer be justified in believing that Tom stole the book. This result might seem like the right result until we discover that Tom’s mother is both delusional and a pathological liar, that she said these things to herself in her padded cell, that John Grabit is a figment of her demented mind, and that Tom stole the book just as I thought. Lehrer and Paxson argue that the fact that it is true that a delusional mental patient uttered false statements about Tom Grabit’s location on the day of the theft should not defeat my knowledge that Tom Stole the book. They conclude that the Chisholm/Klein account of defeaters should be replaced with the follow account:

(D2)     When evidence e justifies S in believing that p, then proposition d is a defeater for S’s justification if and only if (i) d is true, (ii) S is completely justified in believing that d is false, and (iii) the conjunction of d and e does not justify S in believing that p.

In Grabit, I do not have any evidence concerning what Tom’s mother said or didn’t say, and so, I am not completely justified in believing that it is false that she said those things. As a result, condition (ii) of D2 is not satisfied, and so, on the Lehrer/Paxson account of defeaters that fact that Ms. Grabit said those things is not a defeater for my evidence that Tom stole the book. Consequently, on the D2-account of defeaters, I have an undefeated justified true belief that Tom stole the book and thus know that Tom stole the book, which is the intuitively correct result.

The Chisholm/Klein D1-account of defeaters gets the Grabit case wrong, for it entails that the true statement M defeats my justification for thinking that Tom stole the book. Since M is a defeater on the Chisholm/Klein account, their account entails that I do not know that Tom stole the book; when, intuitively, I do know that Tom stole the book. I saw him steal it, and the insane ramblings of his demented mother do nothing to undermine my knowledge.

Now consider a different case:


John Lock is compulsive when it comes to locking his doors. This morning when he left for work, he locked the front door and tripled checked that the door was locked. It is now 11:00 a.m., and John is sitting in his office recalling his morning ritual. He clearly and distinctly remembers locking his front door and triple checking to make sure that it was in fact locked. On the basis of this vivid memorial evidence e, he comes to believe that his front door is locked. Lucy Lock, John’s wife, is notoriously unreliable about locking the doors when she leaves home, which is why John always insists on leaving home after Lucy leaves for work. Unbeknownst to John, Lucy forgot her workout clothes and returned home at 10:30 a.m. to retrieve them, and she just happened to lock the door when she left five minutes later.

So, at 11:00 a.m., John’s belief that the front door is locked is true. Presumably, John does not know that the front door is locked. He thinks the door is locked because he remembers locking it, but that is not why it is locked. It is locked because Lucy absentmindedly and uncharacteristically happened to lock it on her way out. Intuitively, John’s knowledge is defeated by the following true proposition:

(U) The door was unlocked by Lucy at 10:30 a.m.

If U were added to John’s memorial evidence e, John would no longer be justified in believing that his front door is locked. On the Chisholm/Klein D1-account of defeaters, U is a defeater because U is true and the conjunction of U and e would not justify John in believing that his front door is locked. However, on the Lehrer/Paxson D2-account of defeaters, U would not count as a defeater because sitting in his office at 11:00 a.m., John has no evidence concerning whether or not his wife returned home to retrieve her gym clothes, and so, he is not completely justified in believing it false that the door was unlocked by Lucy Lock at 10:30 a.m. Since U is not a defeater on the Lehrer/Paxson account, their account entails that John knows that his front door is locked; when, intuitively, he fails to know that his door is locked, because it is just a matter of luck that Lucy absentmindedly locked it when she left.

The problem for the No Defeaters approach, then, is this: D1 is too weak of an account of defeaters, and as a result, employing a D1-account of defeaters in ND would make ND too strong an account of knowledge; whereas D2 is too strong an account of defeaters, and so, employing it in ND would make ND too weak. Absent an adequate account of defeaters, the No Defeaters approach fails to provide a solution to the problem of epistemic luck.

iv. The Externalist Turn

Externalist theories of justification maintain that epistemic justification is (at least) partly a function of features external to the cognizer, that is, features outside the cognizer’s ken. For example, one prominent externalist theory, process reliabilism, makes a belief’s justificatory status a function of the actual reliability (rather than the perceived reliability) of the process producing that belief. One motivation behind externalism with respect to justification is its unique ability to provide a truth connection that conceptually links justification with truth. To appreciate the importance of this motivation, recall that the role of the justification condition in the JTB-analysis is to rule out lucky guesses as instances of knowledge. In order for justification to be able to properly play that role, there must be some sort of internal connection between justification and truth that makes the former objectively indicative of the latter. Indeed, many epistemologists insist that it is precisely its internal connection to truth that distinguishes epistemic justification from moral and pragmatic justification. To be objectively indicative of truth, justification must be conceptually connected (not merely coincidentally or contingently connected) with truth. In order for there to be a conceptual connection between justification and truth, the following condition must hold: In every possible world W, if conditions C make belief b justified in W, then conditions C also make b objectively probable in W. The rationale for requiring such a truth connection is this: If there were no conceptual connection between justification and truth, it would be just as much a matter of luck when a justified belief turned out to be true as when an unjustified belief turned out to be true. Moreover, a better justified belief would be no more likely to be true than a much less well justified belief, for without a truth connection, no amount of justification is an objective indication of truth.

Unlike externalist theories of justification, no internalist theory of justification can provide the desired conceptual connection between justification and truth. Internalist theories maintain that epistemic justification is solely a function of states internal to the cognizer, such as perceptual states, belief states, memorial seemings, and introspective states. Examples of such theories include classical foundationalism, coherentism, and evidentialism. That no internalist theory of justification can provide a truth connection can be demonstrated as follows: Every internalist theory of justification maintains that the conditions that make a belief justified are entirely specifiable in terms of states internal to the cognizer, and for any set of entirely internally specifiable justification-conferring conditions, CI, there will always be a possible world, WD, where a Cartesian evil demon has seen to it that S possesses the requisite internal states and, hence, satisfies CI, even though all of S’s contingent empirical beliefs are false. Since the conditions CI that make S’s belief b internalistically justified in WD­­ do not make b objectively probable in WD, no internalist theory is capable of providing a truth connection. Because internalistic justification is not conceptually connected to truth, one can easily be internalistically justified in holding a false belief, which can in turn be used to justifiably infer some other belief that may coincidentally turn out to be true. Consequently, employing an internalistic justification condition in the JTB-analysis makes JTB particularly susceptible to Gettier cases.

At first glance, externalistic justification looks more promising as a means of preventing luck from playing a role in the acquisition of true belief, for some externalist theories of justification do provide a conceptual connection between justification and truth. Consider, for example, the following simplified version of process reliabilism:

(PR)     S’s belief b is justified in world W if and only if S’s belief b is produced by a belief-forming cognitive process [BCP] that is W-reliable (where a -reliable BCP is a process that tends to produce beliefs in W that are true in W).

Since PR asserts that a belief is justified in W if and only if it is produced by a W-reliable BCP, and since, by definition, the beliefs produced by a W-reliable process tend to be true in W, PR-justified beliefs have a high objective probability of being true. Because reliably-produced, externalistically-justified beliefs are objectively likely to be true, one might think that replacing the internalistic justification condition in the traditional JTB-analysis with an externalistic justification condition would render JTB immune to Gettier-style counterexamples. William Harper (1996) quickly dispels any such notion, with the following counterexample:


Smith believes that Jones owns a Ford. Smith was with Jones when Jones purchased her Pinto; Smith has seen the official title to the car in Jones’s name; Jones is a reliable informant that has never deceived anyone; and just this morning, Jones gave Smith a ride to work in her Pinto. Smith has a reliably-produced and reliably-sustained belief that Jones owns a Ford. It is now 1:00 p.m. Unbeknownst to Smith, at noon Jones’s Pinto was vaporized by a terrorist bomb; but, also unbeknownst to Smith, exactly at noon Jones won a Ford Falcon in the State Lottery. Hence, Smith has a reliably-formed true belief that Jones owns a Ford, but her belief is not knowledge.

While internalistic justification may be particularly susceptible to being undermined by Gettier-style knowledge-destroying luck, Harper’s counterexample shows that the Gettier problem plagues all fallibilistic theories of justification, both internalistic and externalistic alike. Whatever virtues externalistic justification might have, solving the Gettier problem is not among them.

v. The Causal Theory of Knowing

In his early work, Alvin Goldman (1967) offers a different diagnosis of what has gone wrong in Gettier cases. In Case II, what makes J or B true is the fact that Brown is in Barcelona, but this fact plays no causal role in Smith’s coming to believe that J or B. In Case I, what makes P (P = the person who will get the job has ten coins in her pocket) true is the number of coins in Smith’s pocket, but this fact plays no role in Smith’s coming to believe P. What causes Smith to believe P is the fact that Nelson has ten coins in her pocket, and this latter fact is not what makes P true. Goldman observes that in these cases there is no causal connection between the Gettiered belief and the fact that makes it true. It is the absence of such a connection that allows for the possibility of belief’s being true purely by luck. Goldman concludes that the traditional JTB-analysis should be replaced with the following causal theory of knowledge:

(CTOK)  S knows that p if and only if the fact that p is causally connected in an appropriate way with S’s believing that p.

The appropriate knowledge-producing causal processes that Goldman identifies include: (i) perception, (ii) memory, (iii) inferentially reconstructed causal chains, each inference of which is warranted, and (iv) combinations of (i)-(iii). The causal theory correctly handles all of the cases we have considered so far. We have already seen how it handles Gettier’s original cases. In Café, what makes J or B true is the fact that Brown is in Barcelona, and that fact is appropriately causally connected with Smith’s believing that J or B, because Smith is having an espresso with Brown in Barcelona. Accordingly, CTOK correctly entails that, in Café, Smith knows that J or B. In Grabit, I see Tom steal the book. Tom’s stealing the book in plain eyesight perceptually causes me to believe that he did, and so, once again, CTOK yields the right result: I know that Tom Grabit stole the book. In Locked, what makes it true that the front door is locked is the fact that Lucy locked it, and this fact plays no causal role in John’s believing his front door is locked. In this case, CTOK correctly entails that John does not know that his front door is locked. He’s just lucky that Lucy happened to lock it. Finally, in Falcon, what makes it true that Jones owns a Ford is the fact that she just won a Ford Falcon in the state lottery, and that fact plays no causal role in Smith’s believing that Jones owns a Ford, and so, Smith fails to know that Jones owns a Ford.

Despite its success in handling these cases, the causal theory falls prey to the following counterexample:

Fake Barn County

An eccentric farmer in Minnesota owns all of the land in Fake Barn County. Wanting to appear much richer than he is, this farmer has erected fake barns all throughout the county. From the road, these fake barns look exactly like real barns, when, in reality, they are just two dimensional barn façades. While nearly every barn-looking structure in the county is a fake, there are a few real barns interspersed among the myriad fakes. Henry, who is driving through Fake Barn County, has no idea that there are any fake barns in the county. Looking out the window of his car, Henry sees what looks to be a barn on the hill just up the road and comes to believe that there is a barn on the hill. Purely by chance, Henry happens to be looking at one of the few real barns in the county.

Intuitively, Henry does not know that there is a barn on the hill. He is just lucky to be looking at one of the few real barns in the county. The lucky nature of his present belief becomes even more obvious once we discover that Henry has been forming barn beliefs ever since entering Fake Barn County, and all of these other barn beliefs have been false. Henry has consistently been duped by the façades.

The causal theory fails because it cannot account for Henry’s lack of knowledge in this case. Henry is now looking at one of the few real barns in the county, and this real barn is what is causing him to believe that there is a barn on the hill. Since Henry’s true belief that there is a barn on that hill is appropriately caused via perception by that very barn on that hill, the causal theory mistakenly entails that Henry knows there is a barn on that hill, when clearly he does not.

e. Controversial Cases

As analyses of knowledge aimed as at solving the Gettier problem have grown in sophistication and complexity, so have the purported counterexamples aimed at refuting these analyses. Some of these purported counterexamples are sufficiently complex and controversial that there is no consensus among epistemologists as to whether or not the person in the example knows the proposition in question. Two such cases are discussed below.

i. Beneficial Falsehoods

Although the no essential false grounds approach was largely abandoned once it was shown that there can be all-true-evidence Gettier cases—cases where S’s justification for her lucky belief p does not depend on any false beliefs—there has remained nearly universal agreement among epistemologists that a person fails to know that p if her justification for p essentially depends on a false belief. Peter Klein (2008) is a noteworthy exception. He contends that there can be beneficial falsehoods—falsehoods essential to one’s justification that nevertheless give one knowledge. Here is one example that Klein offers in support of his controversial view:


Based on memory, I believe that my secretary told me on Friday that I have an appointment with a student on Monday. Based on that justified-but-false memorial belief, I come to justifiedly believe that I have an appointment on Monday. As it turns out, I do have that appointment on Monday, and my secretary did tell me of the appointment. However, he didn’t tell me on Friday. He told me on Thursday.

Klein contends that I know that I have an appointment on Monday [A], even though my belief that A essentially depends on my false belief that my secretary told me on Friday about my Monday appointment. It might seem that the false belief that my secretary told me on Friday that I have a Monday appointment is not essential to my justification for A, because if I “remember” that my secretary told me on Friday of my Monday appointment, then presumably I also actually remember that my secretary told me I have an appointment on Monday, and this latter belief is true. But suppose that the secretary was out with the flu the first three days of the week, and also suppose that I do not remember being on campus on Thursday. In fact, I’m confident that I wasn’t on campus on Thursday, having totally forgotten that I briefly stopped in on Thursday to get my mail. Klein contends that in such a situation I would not believe that my secretary told me of the appointment at all, unless I believed that he told me this on Friday. Klein contends that I know that A, even though that belief essentially depends on my false belief that my secretary told me on Friday about my Monday appointment.

What distinguishes beneficial falsehoods from knowledge-destroying falsehoods? Under what circumstances does a false belief f allow S to acquire knowledge that p? Klein’s answers to these questions are rooted in and flow out of his preferred theory of knowledge. Klein contends that knowledge requires both propositional and doxastic justification. Proposition p is propositionally justified for S if and only if S has an epistemically adequate basis for p. S’s belief that p is doxastically justified for S if and only if S’s belief that p has an appropriate causal basis. The basic idea is that in order for S to know that p, S’s belief that p must be epistemically justified and appropriately caused. Armed with the distinction between propositional and doxastic justification, Klein argues that a false belief f is a beneficial falsehood just in case the following seven conditions are met: (i) f is false, (ii) S’s belief that f is doxastically justified (that is, S’s belief that f has an appropriate causal pedigree), (iii) the belief that f is essential in the causal production of the belief that p, (iv) f propositionally justifies p, (v) f entails a true proposition t, (vi) t propositionally justifies p, and (vii) whatever doxastically justifies S in believing that f also propositionally justifies t for S. When these conditions are met, Klein contends that the false belief f is “close enough to the truth” to give one knowledge that p. Applied to the case at hand, F is the false proposition that my secretary told me on Friday that I have an appointment on Monday, and T is the true proposition that my secretary told me that I have an appointment on Monday. Klein contends that my belief that F meets all the conditions for being a beneficial falsehood: (i) F is false, (ii) my belief that F is doxastically justified (appropriately caused) by the fact that he did tell me, (iii) my belief that F is essential to my believing that A (for if I didn’t believe F, I would not believe he had told me about an appointment at all and so I would not believe A), (iv) F propositionally justifies A, (v) F entails the true proposition T, (vi) T propositionally justifies A, and (vii) the fact that my secretary told me on Thursday about my Monday appointment propositionally justifies T for me.

Klein contends that, in the case at hand, it doesn’t really matter what day my secretary told me that I have an appointment on Monday. What matters is the fact that he told me. The false belief that he told me on Friday is close enough to the true proposition that he told me as to give me knowledge that I have an appointment on Monday.

While interesting and provocative, Klein’s case is difficult to assess because it depends on controversial assumptions about belief individuation. Is it possible, for example, to believe that my secretary told me on Friday that I have an appointment on Monday [F], without also believing that my secretary told me that I have an appointment on Monday [T]? If not, then rather than providing us with a case of an indispensable knowledge-generating false belief, Klein may have simply given us another case of justificatory over-determination; for if it is impossible to believe F without also believing T, then there seem to be two independent strands of justification only one of which depends on a false belief, in which case Appointment is simply an analogue of Café above.

ii. Misleading Evidence One Does Not Possess

Gilbert Harman (1973) contends that S’s knowledge that p can be undermined by readily available misleading evidence that S does not possess. In Harman cases, despite the fact that the undermining evidence is misleading, if S were to possess it, S would no longer be justified in believing that p. The idea behind Harman cases seems to be this: Since the misleading evidence is readily available, it is just a matter of luck that S does not possess that evidence, and since luck is incompatible with knowledge, S fails to know that p. Here is one of Harman’s cases:


A political leader is assassinated. His associates, fearing a coup, decide to pretend that the bullet hit someone else. On Nationwide television they announce that an assassination attempt has failed to kill the leader but has killed a secret service man by mistake. However, before the announcement is made, an enterprising reporter on the scene telephones the real story to his newspaper, which has included the story in its final edition. Jill buys a copy of that paper, reads the story of the assassination, and believes that the President has been assassinated based on the story. What she reads is true, and so are her assumptions about how the story came to be in the paper. (1973, 143)

Harman insists that Jill does not know that the President has been assassinated. He finds it highly implausible that Jill should know simply because she lacks evidence that everyone else possesses. Harman’s diagnosis is that Jill’s knowledge is undermined by readily available evidence – the misleading televised retraction – that she does not possess.

Epistemologists who have reflected on Harman’s Assassination case remain divided over whether or not Jill knows that the President has been assassinated. Those who think that she does know that the President has been assassinated tend to focus on the facts that (i) all of her evidence is true, (ii) she knows her evidence is true, and (iii) the evidence she has is an accurate indicator of the President’s assassination.

Those epistemologists who think that Jill does not know that the President has been assassinated do not focus on the quality of Jill’s evidence, which is impeccable. Rather, they focus on the lucky nature of her evidence. If Jill had turned on the TV when she got home, like she usually does, she would have seen the televised retraction, and she would have found herself in the same epistemic predicament as everyone else. Given the conflicting reports, she would not have known what to believe. Clearly, Jill is lucky to be in the evidential situation she is in. Since luck is generally thought to be incompatible with knowledge, these epistemologists conclude that Jill fails to know that the President has been assassinated.

iii. Impact of These Cases

Controversial cases like these make the challenge of providing an accurate analysis of knowledge even more difficult. If Jill does know that the President has been assassinated, then all those theories of knowledge that imply that she lacks such knowledge (including Harman’s own theory) are mistaken. On the other hand, if Jill does not know that the President has been assassinated, then all those theories that imply she does are mistaken. Similarly, if I do not know that I have an appointment on Monday, then all those theories that imply I do (including Klein’s theory) are mistaken. If I do know that I have an appointment on Monday, then all those theories that imply I lack such knowledge are mistaken. The competing intuitions these cases engender make the already difficult task of arriving at a mutually agreed upon account of knowledge even more formidable.

f. Where Things Stand

While various proponents of the above proposals might still embrace them, the general consensus is that none of the above attempts at eliminating epistemic luck succeeds. One problem with these first attempts at resolving the Gettier problem is that they tended to emerge in a piecemeal fashion as responses to specific counterexamples, only to fall prey to more elaborate counterexamples themselves. What seems to be needed is a better understanding of epistemic luck itself. If we can get clear on the exact nature of knowledge-destroying luck, we might be in a better position to formulate a condition that can eliminate it. The next section will examine a number of attempts at clarifying the nature of knowledge-destroying luck and will assess several modal conditions that have been proposed to eliminate such luck.

2. The Paradox of Epistemic Luck

In addition to generating problems for those epistemologists seeking an analysis of knowledge, the phenomenon of epistemic luck gives rise to an epistemological paradox in its own right. The paradox is generated by the following three theses: the knowledge thesis, the incompatibility thesis, and the ubiquity thesis. The paradox arises because each of these theses is antecedently plausible, but together they form an inconsistent triad. Each thesis is discussed below.

a. The Knowledge Thesis

According to the knowledge thesis, we possess a great deal of knowledge about the world around us. Commonsense tells us that the knowledge thesis is true. For example, I know that I am in a coffee shop. I know that I am drinking a cup of coffee. I know that I am wearing a blue shirt. I know that I am typing on a laptop computer. And I know that the person sitting next to me is talking on his cell phone at an inappropriate volume. You know that you have eyes. You know that you are reading an IEP article on epistemic luck. You know that the article you are reading is written in English. Together, we know a lot. At least, we think we do, until we encounter a skeptical paradox like the paradox of epistemic luck.

b. The Incompatibility Thesis (Again)

The incompatibility thesis is the thesis that epistemic luck simpliciter is incompatible with knowledge. As noted above, there has been nearly universal agreement among epistemologists that knowledge is incompatible with epistemic luck. The post-Gettier literature is replete with evermore-sophisticated counterexamples to the array of purported accounts of knowledge proffered in an effort to resolve the Gettier problem. The standard formula for generating a counterexample to a purported analysis of knowledge is to conjure up a case where, despite satisfying all the conditions in the analysis, it is still just a matter of luck that the person’s belief that p is true. The element of luck involved is ipso facto thought to prevent the belief from being an instance of knowledge. The nearly unanimous acceptance of such examples illustrates just how widespread commitment to the incompatibility thesis is.

c. The Ubiquity Thesis

Epistemic luck is an all-pervasive phenomenon that infects every fallibilistic epistemology in one form or other. Its inescapability can be demonstrated as follows: To convert true belief to knowledge, every viable fallibilistic epistemology requires satisfying either some internalistic justification condition or some externalistic condition (that may or may not be a justification condition). But neither an internalistic nor an externalistic condition can completely succeed in eliminating epistemic luck. A little recognized consequence of the new evil demon problem is that internalistic justification is not conceptually connected to truth in any robust way, for demon-world victims have internalistically justified beliefs almost all of which are false. Given the absence of a robust truth connection, it is always in some sense a matter of luck when a merely internalistically justified belief turns out to be true. To see why, consider my twin in an evil demon world WD. By hypothesis, he has the same beliefs that I have, he has the same memorial seemings that I have, he possesses the same experiential evidence that I possess, and he goes through exactly the same internal reflections that I do. In short, our internal cognitive lives are phenomenologically, doxastically, and reflectively indistinguishable. Consequently, if I satisfy the internal conditions for justifiedness (whatever they may be), then my demon-world twin satisfies them as well, and so, we are both internalistically justified in our beliefs. If, on the other hand, I fail to satisfy those conditions, then my twin also fails to satisfy them, and so neither of us is internalistically justified in our beliefs. Now assume the former scenario where both of us are internalistically justified in our beliefs. The only relevant difference between my twin and me is that he is being systematically deceived, whereas, as epistemic good fortune would have it, I am not. If he and I were to change places, there would be no introspectable difference, and each of us would continue to believe as we do, only now I would be the hapless victim of demon deception. Clearly, I am epistemically fortunate to be in the world I am in (assuming I am in the world I take myself to be in) and not in WD. Since I am lucky to be in the world I am in, there is a clear sense in which it is epistemically lucky that my internalistically justified beliefs are true. My twin is not nearly so lucky, for, thanks to the demon, all of his internalistically justified beliefs are false. Since these results can be generated no matter which internalistic theory of justification one employs, it is always a matter of luck when a merely internalistically justified belief happens to be true.

Truth-connected externalist approaches (for example, reliabilist, truth-tracking, and safety-based accounts) avoid this kind of epistemic luck. However, they are subject to another kind of ineliminable epistemic luck. Recall, from section 1, the externalistic process-reliabilist account of epistemic justification:

(PR)     S’s belief b is justified in world W if and only if S’s belief b is produced by a belief-forming cognitive process that is W-reliable.

Call a belief that is justified in virtue of being reliably produced a PR-justified belief. Although it is not typically a matter of luck when a PR-justified belief turns out to be true (since PR-justification is conceptually connected to truth), it is a matter of luck when a belief turns out to be PR-justified. To see why, consider, once again, my twin in the demon world WD. By hypothesis, he and I share the same beliefs, possess the same evidence, go through the same internal reflections, and have phenomenologically, doxastically, and reflectively indistinguishable cognitive lives. Even so, our beliefs do not have the same PR-justificatory status. His beliefs are not PR-justified, because they are produced by processes that the demon has rendered unreliable in WD, whereas my beliefs are PR-justified because they are produced by processes that are reliable in the actual world (Again, I’m assuming, for the sake of the example, that the actual world is the world we think it is.). According to PR, it is not a matter of luck that my beliefs are true and his beliefs are false, because my beliefs are PR-justified and his are not, and PR-justified beliefs have a high objective probability of being true. What is a matter of luck is the fact that my beliefs are PR-justified and his are not. After all, we both take ourselves to be in non-demon-manipulated worlds, and we both take ourselves to have reliably-produced PR-justified beliefs. As luck and ill luck, respectively, would have it, I am correct and he is incorrect. Since there is no introspectively discernible difference between our worlds, given what each of us has to go on, there is a clear sense in which I could have just as easily been mistaken and been the one with demon-rendered-unreliable processes. Compared to my twin, I am epistemically fortunate to be in a non-demon world where my cognitive faculties are reliable. Since I am epistemically lucky (compared with my twin) to be in a world where I have reliable cognitive processes, there is clearly a sense in which it is just a matter of luck that I have PR-justified beliefs.

Analogous considerations can be applied to any externalistic constraint on knowledge. Consider the externalistic condition of being a safe belief (to be explained below). While a safe belief’s being true is not epistemically lucky, having safe beliefs is epistemically lucky, for in a demon world none of one’s beliefs are safe. Since every fallibilistic epistemology incorporates either an internalistic justification condition or an externalistic condition, no fallibilistic epistemology can rid us of epistemic luck’s intractable presence.

d. The Skeptical Challenge

Epistemic luck, then, is ubiquitous and unavoidable. If all forms of epistemic luck are incompatible with knowledge, as the incompatibility thesis maintains, skepticism is correct and the knowledge thesis is false. And yet, we remain convinced that we possess lots of knowledge. The task facing the anti-skeptical epistemologist is to reconcile the rather strong intuition that epistemic luck is not compatible with knowledge with the equally evident observation that it must be. Since the ubiquity thesis is unassailable, the anti-skeptical epistemologist must reject the incompatibility thesis.

e. Rejecting the Incompatibility Thesis

Peter Unger (1968) was the first epistemologist to note that not all forms of epistemic luck are incompatible with knowledge. He identified the following three types of benign epistemic luck: (1) Propositional luck: It can be entirely accidental that p is true, and S can still know that p. For example, a person who witnesses an automobile accident can certainly know that the accident occurred. (2) Existential luck: For S to know that p, S must exist, and it might be extraordinarily lucky that S exists. If S is the lone survivor of a fiery plane crash, S is lucky to be alive, but S’s existential luck does not preclude her from knowing that she survived the crash. (3) Facultative luck: To know that p, S must possess the cognitive skills requisite for knowledge. Suppose S is shot in the head but the bullet narrowly misses all vital regions of the brain required for conceptual thought and knowledge. S is overwhelmingly lucky that she still possesses the cognitive capacities needed for knowledge, but since she does possess them, she is still capable of knowing many things, including that she was shot in the head.

f. Knowledge-Destroying Epistemic Luck

Unger has successfully identified three types of harmless epistemic luck, but not all forms of epistemic luck are benign. What is needed is an account of knowledge-undermining luck.

i. Evidential vs. Veritic Luck

Mylan Engel Jr. (1992) distinguishes two kinds of epistemic luck, evidential luck and veritic luck, and argues that only the latter is incompatible with knowledge. Engel characterizes these two types of luck as follows:

(EL)     A person S is evidentially lucky in believing that p in circumstances C if and only if it is just a matter of luck that S has the evidence e for p that she does, but given her evidence e, it is not a matter of luck that her belief that p is true in C.

(VL)    A person S is veritically lucky in believing that p in circumstances C if and only if, given S’s evidence for p, it is just a matter of luck that S’s belief that p is true in C.

To see that evidential luck is compatible with knowledge, suppose that a bank robber’s mask slips momentarily during a holdup and the startled teller sees clearly that the robber is the bank president. In such a situation, the teller would clearly be lucky to have the evidence she does, but she would nevertheless know that the bank president is the villain.

Engel argues that all genuine Gettier cases involve veritic luck. In Gettier’s Case II presented above, Smith’s belief that J or B is veritically lucky: Given Smith’s misleading evidence of Jones’s Ford-ownership status and her total lack of evidence concerning Brown’s whereabouts, it is just a matter of luck that Smith’s belief that J or B is true. Veritic luck with respect to p is incompatible with knowing that p, because it undercuts the connection between S’s evidence for p and the truth of p in a way that makes it entirely coincidental from S’s point of view that p is true.

Engel then uses the distinction between evidential and veritic luck to assess Harman cases. Jill is not veritically lucky in believing that the President has been assassinated, for she has accurate, reliable evidence concerning the assassination in the form of a reputable newspaper’s column, and given this evidence, it is not a matter of luck that her belief is true. However, Jill is evidentially lucky—she is lucky to be in the evidential situation that she is in, for had she turned on the TV and seen the fabricated retraction, she would have been in a much worse evidential situation vis-à-vis the President’s assassination. Lucky for her, she did not turn on the TV Like the bank teller above, Jill is lucky to have the evidence she does, but given her evidence, she is not lucky that her belief is true. Having argued that only veritic luck is incompatible with knowledge, Engel concludes that Jill does know the President has been assassinated. If Engel is right, then Harman cases do not provide examples of knowledge-undermining luck.

ii. Justification-Oriented Luck

Hamid Vahid (2001) maintains that there are two types of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck. He agrees with Engel that veritic luck as characterized by VL is incompatible with knowledge, but he argues, contra Engel, that there is a kind of evidential luck (which he dubs ‘justification-oriented luck’) that is also incompatible with knowledge. Vahid contends that knowledge-precluding justification-oriented luck is a function of how easily a person’s belief could have been unjustified:

(JL)      A person suffers from knowledge-precluding justification-oriented luck, when she is justified in believing that p, but given her epistemic circumstances, she could have easily been unjustified in holding that very belief.

Vahid contends that Harman’s Assassination case provides an example of knowledge-precluding justification-oriented luck. Jill could have easily been unjustified in believing that the President was assassinated. Had she turned on the TV like she usually does, she would not have been justified in holding that belief. Vahid concludes that Jill does not know that the President was assassinated—her knowledge is destroyed by justification-oriented luck.

While JL might yield the right result in Harman’s Assassination case, it seems to yield the wrong result with respect to the bank teller case. The teller is justified in believing that the bank president is the robber because she just happened to look up during the brief moment when his mask had slipped and clearly saw the robber’s face, but she could have easily been unjustified in this belief. Had she continued to look in her cash drawer while nervously collecting the cash for the robber, she would not have seen the robber’s face. Clearly, the teller knows that the bank president is the robber, and yet, JL implies that she lacks such knowledge.

iii. Modal Veritic Luck

Duncan Pritchard (2003) agrees that, of these types of luck, only veritic luck is incompatible with knowledge, but he replaces Engel’s evidence-based characterization of veritic luck with the following modal analysis:

(MVL)  For all agents S and propositions p, the truth of S’s belief that p is veritically lucky if and only if S’s belief that p is true in the actual world a but false in nearly all nearby possible worlds in which S forms the belief in the same manner as in a.

MVL differs from VL in the following way: it concerns the connection between the method of belief formation and proposition believed, rather than the connection between S’s evidence and the proposition for which it is evidence. Pritchard argues that a safety-based neo-Moorean account, according to which knowledge is safe true belief, is capable of eliminating veritic luck. In a moment, we will see, contra Pritchard, that safe true belief is incapable of ruling out certain paradigm cases of veritic luck.

g. Second-Wave Anti-Luck Epistemologies

The post-Gettier literature is rife with attempts at supplementing or amending the traditional JTB-analysis with a satisfactory anti-luck constraint on knowledge. As surveyed in Section 1, the first wave of proposals included adding a no-false-grounds or no-essential-false-grounds condition to JTB, supplementing JTB with a defeasibility condition, incorporating an externalistic justification condition in JTB, and replacing JTB with a causal theory of knowing. These and similar proposals have fallen prey to ever-more-complicated Gettier-style examples. The general consensus is that none of these proposals succeeds. Second-wave luck-eliminating proposals invoke counterfactual or subjunctive constraints on knowing, principal among them: sensitivity and safety. Let us consider each of these proposals in turn.

i. Sensitivity

S’s belief that p is sensitive to p’s truth-value if and only if S would not believe that p if p were false (that is, if and only if S does not believe p in any of the closest ~p-worlds). To be sure, sensitive belief does preclude veritic luck, but it does so at a steep price. First, the sensitive-true-belief account of knowledge results in closure failure. Second, there are compelling reasons to think that knowledge does not require sensitivity. Let’s examine each cost in turn.

Most epistemologists regard it as all but axiomatic that we can expand our knowledge by competently deducing some currently unknown proposition u from some other known proposition k whenever we know that k entails u. This widely-embraced idea is codified in the principle of epistemic closure which has been formulated in each of the following ways:

(PEC1)   If S knows that p and S knows that p entails q, then S knows (or is in a position to know) that q.

(PEC2)   If (i) S knows that p, (ii) S knows that p entails q, (iii) S competently deduces q from her knowledge that p and that p entails q, and (iv) S comes to believe q as a result of that competent deduction, then S knows that q.

One reason the principle of epistemic closure has enjoyed such widespread endorsement is this: If I know that p and know that p entails q and I deduce and come to believe q from that knowledge, my belief that q could not be false (because knowledge is factive and the truth of p entails q, together with the truth of p, guarantees the truth of q).

The following example illustrates why sensitive-true-belief accounts of knowledge result in closure failure. I currently believe that I am in a coffee shop [C]. My belief that C is sensitive. If I were not in a coffee shop, I would not believe that I was, for if I were not in a coffee shop, I would be somewhere else, for example, the grocery store or my office, and would not mistakenly think that I was at a coffee shop. Since my belief that C is sensitive (that is, I would not believe it if it were false), the sensitive-true-belief account of knowledge entails that I know that C. I also currently believe that I am not at home in bed having a lifelike dream of being in a coffee shop [~H], but my belief that ~H is not sensitive, for if I were at home in bed having a lifelike dream of being in a coffee shop (that is, if ~H were false), I would still believe that ~H. So, according to the sensitive-true-belief account, I do not know that ~H. Of course, my being at the coffee shop entails that I am not at home in bed dreaming that I am in a coffee shop (that is, C ==> ~H), and I know that C ==> ~H. The sensitive-true-belief account results in closure failure because it entails that I know that C and know that C ==> ~H, but I do not know (and cannot come to know) that ~H on that basis.

Most epistemologists regard the principle of epistemic closure to be so plausible that they find any theory of knowledge that results in closure failure deeply problematic if not outright absurd. In fairness to sensitivity theorists, they recognize that their theories entail closure failure and acknowledge the antecedent implausibility of closure failure, but they argue that, despite its counterintuitiveness, there are principled reasons for thinking that knowledge is not closed under known implication. They grant that we have all sorts of ordinary knowledge, but insist that we do not know and cannot know that the skeptic’s hypotheses are false. Thus, they embrace closure failure because they think that it accurately captures our actual epistemic situation. Perhaps sensitivity theorists are right, but given how widely accepted the principle of epistemic closure is, it would be preferable to identify an anti-luck constraint that avoids closure failure.

The second major problem facing the sensitivity proposal, as Jonathan Vogel (1999) shows with Hole-In-One, is that knowledge does not require sensitivity. The fourth hole at Augusta National Golf Course where The Masters is played is a tricky 240-yard par 3, euphemistically called “Flowering Crabapple.” In 2007, not one player shot a hole-in-one on this diabolical hole, and there were only eleven birdies throughout four rounds of play. Right now, I know that not all seventy-two players in this year’s Masters will shoot a hole-in-one on Flowering Crabapple in the first round of play, but my belief to this effect is not sensitive. Were every golfer to shoot a hole-in-one on Flowering Crabapple in Round One of the Masters in defiance of the astronomical odds against it, I would still believe that they were not going to do so. So, sensitivity is not necessary for knowledge.

ii. Safety

Considerations such as these have led a number of epistemologists (Sosa 1999 & 2000, Williamson 2000a & 2000b, Pritchard 2005) to replace the sensitivity condition with some sort of safety condition. Safety comes in different strengths: S’s true belief that p is strongly safe if and only if were S to believe that p, p would be true (that is, in all the closest worlds where S believes p, p is true). S’s true belief that p is weakly safe if and only if S would not easily be mistaken with respect to p (that is, in the overwhelming majority of nearby worlds where S believes that p, p is true).

Peter Murphy (2005) employs Saul Kripke’s famous counterexample to sensitivity to show that strong safety results in closure failure. Suppose the following is true of Fake Barn County: The landscape is peppered with barn façades, there are a few real barns in the county, some of the real barns are red and some are blue, but all of the façades are red. Driving through Fake Barn County, Mary is unaware that the most of the barn-looking structures are façades. She looks at a blue barn and comes to believe that she is looking at a blue barn. Her belief is safe. In all nearby worlds where she believes she is looking at a blue barn, she is looking at a blue barn, for there are no blue façades. However, her belief that she is looking at a barn is not safe. There are many nearby worlds where she believes she’s looking at a barn, but is really just looking at a façade. So, strong safety entails that Mary knows she’s looking at a blue barn, but does not know she’s looking at a barn.

Weak safety is open to a different worry. If knowledge only requires weakly-safe justified true belief, then a person who justifiably believes her lottery ticket will lose knows that her ticket will lose (unless, of course, it happens to win), because in the overwhelming majority of nearby worlds, her ticket is a loser. Many epistemologists (though not all) insist that people do not know their lottery tickets will lose, prior to hearing the announced results. Anyone convinced that people do not know their tickets will lose, before learning of the results, will think that weak safety is too weak of an anti-luck constraint on knowledge.

Avram Hiller and Ram Neta (2007) convincingly argue that no safe belief condition can eliminate all cases of veritic luck as follows: Start with a justified-but-false-and-unsafe belief like Smith's belief that Jones owns a Ford. Next, have Smith justifiably infer a disjunction of the form J or ~G, where Smith has no evidence whatsoever that ~G is true and where unbeknownst to Smith, ~G is true in all nearby worlds. Let ~G = Brown will not win a Grammy. Suppose that, unbeknownst to Smith, Brown is totally devoid of musical talent and there is no remotely close world where Brown wins a Grammy. Then, Smith's true belief that J or ~G will be safe, but veritically lucky nonetheless, because given Smith’s evidence, it is just a matter of luck that J or ~G is true. Since the safe-true-belief account cannot rule out all cases of veritic luck, safe-true-belief is not sufficient for knowledge.

Hiller and Neta’s example also shows that Pritchard’s modal account of veritic luck [MVL] is not the correct analysis of veritic luck. Smith’s belief that J or ~G is clearly veritically lucky: Smith bases her belief that J or ~G on her justified-but-false-and-unsafe-belief that Jones owns a Ford. Since Smith has absolutely no knowledge or evidence of Brown’s total lack of musical talent, given Smith’s evidence, it is just a matter of luck that her belief that J or ~G is true. But MVL entails that Smith’s belief is not veritically lucky. According to MVL, a belief is veritically lucky if it is true in the actual world but false in nearly all nearby worlds where Smith forms the belief in the same manner. In Hiller and Neta’s case, Smith’s belief that J or ~G is true in the actual world, but it is also true in all nearby worlds where it is formed in the same way (because ~G is true in all nearby worlds). Thus, according to MVL, Smith’s belief that J or ~G is not veritically lucky. Since Smith’s belief is veritically lucky, the MVL analysis of veritic luck is mistaken.

h. Paradox Lost

The paradox of epistemic luck dissolves once we recognize that the incompatibility thesis is false. Not all forms of epistemic luck are incompatible with knowledge. Certainly propositional, existential, and facultative luck are compatible with knowledge, and at least some forms of evidential luck, like the evidential luck had by the bank teller above, are also compatible with knowledge. There is growing consensus that veritic luck is the principal form of knowledge-destroying luck. Since veritic luck is far from ubiquitous, the incompatibility of veritic luck with knowledge poses no general threat to the possibility of knowledge. One can know that p whenever it is not a matter of veritic luck that one’s justified belief that p is true.

3. Epistemic Luck and Knowing that One Knows

Although there remains broad disagreement over how exactly to formulate the condition needed to rule out knowledge-destroying epistemic luck in a theory of knowledge, there is widespread consensus that whatever the correct condition is, S does not need to know that that condition has been met in order to know that p. The point can be illustrated as follows: Let the expression “S is not Gettiered with respect to p” serve as a placeholder for whatever the correct substantive luck-eliminating condition is. If we add this condition to the traditional justified-true-belief analysis, we get the following schema for analyzing knowledge:

(K) S knows that p if and only if:

(i) p is true,

(ii) S believes that p,

(iii) S is justified in believing that p, and

(iv) S is not Gettiered with respect to p.

According to (K), S does not need to know that conditions (i)-(iv) are met in order to know that p. All that (K) requires for S to know that p is that conditions (i)-(iv) be met. Since S need not know or even believe that she is not Gettiered with respect to p in order to know that p, the possibility of Gettier-style, knowledge-destroying, veritic luck poses no special obstacle to first-order knowledge (where ‘first-order knowledge’ refers to knowing that p and ‘second-order knowledge’ refers to knowing that one knows that p). As long as S is not veritically lucky with respect to p, she will know that p, according to schema (K), provided she has a justified true belief that p.

The situation seems to be quite different when it comes to knowing that one knows, for one of the most natural ways of coming to know that one knows that p is by knowing that one has met the conditions required for knowing that p, and knowing the latter requires knowing that one is not Gettiered with respect to p. The burden of the present section is to examine whether the phenomenon of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck undermines more reflective forms of knowledge, such as, knowing that one knows.

a. Internalism, Epistemic Luck, and the Problem of Knowing that One Knows

Arch internalist H.A. Pritchard (1950) famously remarked: “We must recognize that whenever we know something we either do, or at least can, by reflecting, directly know that we are knowing it.” Other internalists have been less sanguine about the prospects of second-order knowledge. For example, Roderick Chisholm (1986) argues that one cannot generally know that one knows on the grounds that one cannot generally know whether or not one’s evidence for p is defeated by Gettier considerations. Is Chisholm right? Does the Gettier problem pose special—indeed, generally insurmountable—obstacles to internalistically knowing that one internalistically knows that p? Richard Feldman (1981) does not think so. He thinks that the Gettier problem poses a minor obstacle to second-order knowledge, but one that can be easily overcome with minimal intellectual effort. Mylan Engel Jr. (2000) disagrees. Siding with Chisholm, Engel argues that the Gettier problem poses three distinct challenges to second-order knowledge, which, when taken together, threaten to undermine the possibility of knowing that one knows. Michael Roth (1990) contends that the Gettier problem poses no threat to second-order knowledge whatsoever. To assess these competing views, it will be helpful to have a clearer idea of just what is required for internalistic knowledge.

Post-Gettier internalists with respect to knowledge tend to work within the JTB+ tradition in that they maintain that, in addition to true belief, knowledge requires internalistic justification as well as some fourth externalistic anti-luck condition to rule out Gettier cases. Accordingly, by replacing condition (iii) in schema (K) above with an explicitly internalistic justification condition, we arrive at a schema for internalistic knowledge that most internalists would readily embrace:

(Ki)      S internalistically knows (knowsi) that p if and only if:

(k1) p is true,

(k2) S believes that p,

(k3) S is internalistically justified (justifiedi) in believing that p, and

(k4) S is not Gettiered with respect to p.

Since (Ki) provides a perfectly general account of knowledgei, we can arrive at the conditions for second-order knowledgei simply by substituting S knowsi that p for p in schema (Ki):

(KiKi) S knowsi that S knowsi that p if and only if:

(kk1) S knowsi that p is true,

(kk2) S believes that S knowsi that p,

(kk3) S is justifiedi in believing that S knowsi that p, and

(kk4) S is not Gettiered with respect to S knowsi that p.

Chisholm doubts that (kk3) can be satisfied. To appreciate Chisholm’s worry, consider one of the most natural and straightforward ways of satisfying condition (kk3), namely, being justifiedi in believing that one has met all of the conditions required for knowingi that p:

(JiKip)    S is justifiedi­­ in believing that S knowsi that p if and only if:

(jk1) S is justifiedi­­ in believing that p,

(jk2) S is justifiedi­­ in believing that S believes that p,

(jk3) S is justifiedi­­ in believing that S is justifiedi in believing that p, and

(jk4) S is justifiedi­­ in believing that S is not Gettiered with respect to p.

Since (jk1) is identical to (k3), (jk1) is satisfied whenever S knowsi that p; and if we assume both doxastic and justificationali transparency (that is, if we assume that we have introspective access to what we believe and to our justificationi for what we believe), as do many internalists, then (jk2) and (jk3) also pose no special problems for the would-be second-order knower.

Chisholm’s concern is with (jk4). He contends that we cannot typically tell whether or not our evidence for p is defeated by Gettier considerations. Based on this contention, Chisholm argues as follows: Let S be any one of us and let p be a proposition that S knowsi. Since S cannot tell whether S’s evidence for p is defeated by Gettier considerations, S is not justifiedi in believing that S is not Gettiered with respect to p. Hence, (jk4) is not satisfied. Since (jk4) is not satisfied, S is not justifiedi­ in believing that S knowsi that p, that is, (kk3) is not satisfied. Since (kk3) is a necessary condition for knowingi that one knowsi that p, S does not knowi­ that S knowsi that p. The gist of Chisholm’s argument is this: Since we are not justifiedi in believing that we are not Gettiered with respect to p, we do not knowi that we knowi that p.

Feldman disagrees. He thinks that, with minimal effort, a person who knowsi that p can be justifiedi in believing that she is not Gettiered with respect to p. Feldman offers two reasons for thinking that it is relatively easy to be justifiedi in believing that one’s evidence for p is not defective and thus that one is not Gettiered with respect to p. Since Feldman is primarily concerned with determining when a person who knowsi that p knowsi that she knowsi that p, he assumes that S has first-order knowledgei that p when presenting his reasons.

No False Evidence

Assume that S knowsi that p. S’s knowingi that p entails that S is justifiedi in believing that p. Since S is justifiedi in believing that p, S is also justified­i­ in believing that all of her evidence for p is true. Since false evidence is usually what makes one’s evidence defective, S is justified in believing that her justificationi for p is not defective and thus that she is not Gettiered with respect to p.


Since S has very rarely found herself to be the victim of Gettier-type situations, she is justifiedi in believing that such situations are very rare and atypical. Given their rarity and atypicality, S is justifiedi in believing that she is not is such a situation with respect to p.

Feldman contends that No False Evidence and Induction provide S with good internalistic reasons for believing that she is not Gettiered with respect to p. Since internalistic justification is a function of having good internalistic reasons and S has good internalistic reasons for believing that she is not Gettiered with respect to p, S is justifiedi in believing that she is not Gettiered with respect to p, that is, (jk4) is satisfied. Since (jk1)-(jk3) are also easily satisfiable, with minimal intellectual effort, S can be justifiedi in believing that she knowsi that p. Feldman concludes that satisfying (kk3) poses no special obstacle to knowingi that one knowsi.

Engel contends that the Gettier problem generates three distinct challenges for the would-be second-order knower—challenges that threaten to undermine the satisfaction of (kk1), (kk3), and (kk4), respectively:

(1) First-order actual Gettierization: One way the Gettier problem can preclude S from knowingi that she knowsi that p is by preventing S from knowingi that p. If S is Gettiered with respect to p, then S fails to knowi that p, and thus, she fails to knowi that she knows that p, since (kk1) is unsatisfied. However, since first-order actual Gettierization precludes second-order knowledgei only when it obtains, it poses no greater threat to second-order knowledgei than it poses to first-order knowledgei.

(2) First-order possible (but non-actual) Gettierization: While actual first-order Gettierization, when it obtains, undermines second-order knowledgei by falsifying (kk1), possible (but non-actual) first-order Gettierization threatens to thwart one of the most natural ways of satisfying (kk3), namely, satisfying conditions (jk1)-(jk4) of JiKip. Like Chisholm, Engel’s concern here is with (jk4). He argues that the reasons Feldman offersNo False Evidence and Inductiondo not provide adequate reasons for thinking that one is not Gettiered with respect to p. No False Evidence is not a good reason to think that one has not been Gettiered with respect to p because, as noted in Section 1, there can be all-true-evidence Gettier cases, a point that Feldman himself demonstrated in an earlier article (Feldman, 1974). While No False Evidence may provide S with a reason for thinking that she is not the victim of a Gettier case involving a justified-false-belief, it provides her with no reason to think that she is not the victim of an all-true-evidence Gettier case. The problem with Induction is that many of the Gettier cases described in the literature are what we might call “invisible” Gettier cases, that is, they are cases such that, were they to obtain, the Gettier victim would never find out. They are cases that look and feel like knowledge and pass away unnoticed. Unless Pyromaniac Pete is wearing a Geiger counter, he will never discover that it was Q-radiation and not striking friction that caused his defective Sure Fire match to light. Unless John Lock interrogates Lucy Lock about her morning routine, he will likely never discover that she unlocked the doors to their house at 10:30 a.m. Unless Henry leaves the highway and investigates, he will likely never discover that most of the barn-looking structures are façades. Considerations such as these make it plausible to think that invisible Gettier cases are more likely to be the norm than visible Gettier cases. The fact that S has rarely found herself to be Gettiered in the past may provider her with a reason for thinking that visible Gettier cases are rare, but it provides her no reason to think that invisible Gettier cases are rare, and without such a reason, she is not justified­i in believing that she is not being (invisibly) Gettiered with respect to p. Engel concludes that it is much more difficult to be justifiedi in believing that one is not Gettiered with respect to p than Feldman alleges.

(3) Meta-Gettierization: Engel dubs second-order Gettierization “meta-Gettierization.” Just as first-order Gettierization occurs when S’s justification for p is defective in a way that makes S veritically lucky with respect to p, meta-Gettierization occurs when S’s justification for believing that S knowsi that p is defective in a way that makes S veritically lucky with respect to S knowsi that p. By way of illustration, Engel asks us to consider Professor Cleaver, a fictitious philosophy professor from the 1950s, who, as a pre-Gettier epistemologist, justifiably accepts the JTB-analysis of knowledge. Since Cleaver is justifiedi in believing that knowledgei is justifiedi true belief, he is justifiedi in believing that (jk1)-(jk3) are jointly sufficient for being justifiedi in believing that one knowsi that p. Since he is justifiedi in believing that (jk1)-(jk3) are jointly sufficient for being justifiedi in believing that one knowsi that p, he is justifiedi in believing that he knowsi that p provided that he is justifiedi in believing that he has justifiedi-true-belief that p. Let p be a proposition that Cleaver knowsi. If he believes that he knowsi that p, and if he is justifiedi in believing that he knowsi that p on the basis of his justifiedi-but-false-belief that knowledgei is justifiedi true belief, together with his justifiedi-true-belief that he has a justifiedi-true-belief that p, then Cleaver will have a justifiedi-true-belief that he knowsi that p, which falls short of knowledgei because his justificationi essentially depends on his justifiedi-but-false-belief that knowledgei is justifiedi true belief. The point generalizes. Anytime that Cleaver comes to believe that he knowsi that p on the basis of his justifiedi-but-false-belief that the JTB-analysis is correct, he will automatically be meta-Gettierized and will, thus, fail to knowi that he knowsi that p. Engel then argues that whether those of us who have grown up in the post-Gettier enlightenment can avoid Cleaver’s fate depends on whether any of us justifiedly­i believes a true epistemology. Since no epistemology to date is immune to objection, Engel thinks it doubtful that any of us holds a true epistemology (no matter how well justifiedi we might be in our preferred epistemology). Given how likely it is that we are operating with a false epistemology, Engel contends that whenever we come to believe that we knowi that p on the basis of our preferred epistemology, we are almost certain to become yet another meta-Gettier casualty, for we are almost certain to have based our belief that we ­­knowi that p on a justifiedi false belief about the requirements for knowledgei.

Roth contends that the debate over whether the Gettier problem poses a major or minor obstacle to second-order knowledgei is entirely misguided. He argues that Gettier considerations pose no obstacle to second-order knowledgei whatsoever. His argument is rooted in what he calls the Fallibilist Assumption Governing Empirical Knowledge:

(FA)    For every proposition of the form Kp (where p is empirical and K is the knowledge operator), there are certain contingencies such that: (i) their obtaining is physically possible, (ii) were they to obtain, Kp would be false, and (iii) S is completely justified in disregarding any of these contingencies in considering whether she has adequate justification for p.

Roth contends that there are two types of Kp-falsifying contingencies. “Type I contingencies” satisfy conditions (i), (ii), and (iii) of (FA). “Type II contingencies” satisfy conditions (i) and (ii), but not (iii). Roth asks us to imagine a great dividing wall – The Wall of Fallibilism – that separates the Type I contingencies from the Type II contingencies. As Roth envisions it, the Wall of Fallibilism plays an important role in protecting us from knowledge-destroying epistemic luck. If, given S’s evidence for p in circumstances C, it is simply a matter of luck that p is true in C, then S does not know that p in C. To ensure that it is not just a matter of veritic luck that S’s belief that p is true (in C), S must be suitably protected from error with respect to p (in C). According to Roth, the Wall protects us from the slings and arrows of outrageous Type I error possibilities by cordoning us off from these remote properly ignorable Kp-falsifying contingencies. We do not need evidence that these contingencies do not obtain in order to knowi that p. Being safely outside the Wall, we do not need to take them into account in our epistemic reflections at all. Their sheer remoteness and improbability protects us from having to worry about them. As long as they do not actually obtain, these contingencies provide no obstacle to knowledgei whatsoever. But the Wall does not provide us with all the protection from luck and error that we need in order to possess knowledgei. We must also be protected from error with respect to those Type II contingencies that are inside the Wall. These p-falsifying contingencies are genuinely in doubt. Were any of these contingencies to obtain, p would be false, and as a result, so too would Kp. To protect us from these realistic non-ignorable ~p-possibilities, we need justification that precludes them. The picture of fallible knowledgei that emerges is this:

S knowsi that p only if (i) S’s justificationi is strong enough to rule out all of the relevant Type II ~p-possibilities inside the Wall and (ii) none of the Type I contingencies outside the Wall obtain.

Roth thinks that the Wall metaphor explains why Gettier considerations pose no obstacle to second-order knowledgei­­. Gettier considerations are paradigm cases of Type I contingencies. We do not need to knowi or even believe that Type I contingencies do not obtain in order to knowi that p. As long as no Type I contingencies obtain, S will knowi that p provided she satisfies the other conditions required for knowingi that p. Like Type I contingencies generally, Gettier considerations only undermine knowledgei when they obtain. We do not need to knowi or even believe that no Gettier circumstances obtain in order to knowi that p. As long as they do not obtain, we will knowi that p provided we have met the other conditions required for knowingi that p. Since Gettier contingencies are outside the Wall, Roth contends that it is perfectly proper to ignore them when trying to determine whether one knowsi that p.

Roth’s reason for thinking that Gettier contingencies pose no obstacle to knowingi that one knowsi is that he thinks that Gettier possibilities are properly ignorable Type I contingencies that lie safely outside the Wall. The problem with Roth’s argument is that the Wall’s location is not fixed. As Roth himself admits, where the Wall is situated is relativized to a particular attempt to acquire knowledgei of a particular proposition. Which contingencies are outside the Wall and which are not, that is, which contingencies are properly ignorable and which are not, is a function of the proposition one is attempting to come to knowi and the circumstances under which one is trying to come to knowi it. While Gettier contingencies vis-à-vis p are clearly properly ignorable where coming to knowi that p is concerned, they are not properly-ignorable when it comes to knowingi that Kp. To the contrary, it seems that Kp-destroying Gettier contingencies are precisely the kind of contingencies that one needs to be able to rule out in order to know that one knows that p. Gettier contingencies are not p-falsifying contingencies (for p is true in Gettier situations), but they are Kp-falsifying contingencies. As such, they are Type I contingencies when it comes to knowingi that p, but Type II contingencies when it comes to knowingi that one knowsi that p. In effect, the Wall moves outward where second-order knowledgei is concerned. The very same Gettier contingencies that are outside the p-Wall are inside the Kp-Wall. Being inside the Kp-Wall, they are not properly ignorable when it comes to knowingi that Kp. To knowi that one knowsi that p, one must knowi that no Gettier Kp-falsifying contingencies obtain. It is precisely because we cannot generally knowi that no Gettier contingencies obtain that Chisholm and Engel contend that second-order knowledgei is difficult to attain.

b. Epistemic Luck and Reflective Knowledge

Even if veritic luck poses no special problem for reflectively knowing that one knows, Duncan Pritchard contends that another more worrisome kind of epistemic luck does preclude such knowledge. Reflective epistemic luck arises when, from the agent’s reflective position, it is just a matter of luck that her belief is true. More precisely:

MRL   For all S and p, the truth of S’s belief that p is reflectively lucky if and only if S’s belief that p is true in the actual world but, in nearly all nearby possible worlds consistent with what S is able to know by reflection alone, were S to believe p, p would be false.

When it comes to modal reflective luck, the epistemically relevant possible worlds are ordered in a non-standard way solely in terms of what the agent is able to know on the basis of her subjective internal reflections alone. Accordingly, any possible world consistent with S’s having that same internally accessible evidence that she has in the actual world will be reflectively equally close to the actual world. Since, by hypothesis, S would have exactly the same internally accessible evidence in a demon world or a BIV-world that she has in the actual world, these worlds are just as close, reflectively, to the actual world as is the world where everything is just as it seems. Since our ordinary commonsense perceptual beliefs are false in a wide variety of these reflectively equally close skeptical-scenario possible worlds, Pritchard maintains that MRL entails that our ordinary commonsense perceptual beliefsif true in the actual worldare reflectively lucky. [Whether MRL actually entails that all of our true commonsense perceptual beliefs are reflectively lucky is by no means obvious. The fact that our commonsense beliefs are false in malevolent demon and BIV worlds does not show that these beliefs are false in nearly all reflectively equally close possible worlds. After all, for every malevolent demon world where we are systematically deceived, there is a corresponding benevolent demon world that is just as close, reflectively, in which the benevolent demon sees to it that all of our commonsense beliefs are true.]

Pritchard thinks that reflective luck is not incompatible with ordinary knowledge (he thinks only veritic luck is), but he insists that reflective luck is incompatible with a much-desired internalistic kind of robust reflective knowledge. Pritchard contends that skeptical challenges force us to confront the fundamental human epistemic predicament, to wit, that we cannot know, on the basis of reflection alone, that the skeptic’s radical hypotheses are false. For example, he thinks that we cannot know, by reflection alone, that we are not bodiless brains being kept alive in vats of nutrient being deceived into thinking we have hands.

If Pritchard is right that we lack reflective knowledge that the skeptic’s hypotheses are false, then those who think that reflective knowledge is closed under known entailment face an even greater skeptical threat. According to the principle of epistemic closure (PEC1): If S knows that p and also knows that p entails q, then S either knows or is in a position to know that q. Since we know that having hands entails not being a deceived bodiless brain in a vat, if we cannot have reflective knowledge that we are not deceived bodiless brains in vats, then given PEC1, we cannot have reflective knowledge that we have hands. The point can, of course, be generalized. Since radical skeptical hypotheses are incompatible with virtually all of the ordinary propositions we routinely take ourselves to know, if we lack reflective knowledge that radical skeptical hypotheses are false, then we lack reflective knowledge of the most mundane of ordinary propositions.

Pritchard contends that skeptical challenges force us to recognize the reflectively lucky nature of our anti-skeptical beliefs and that this, in turn, explains the enduring epistemic angst that skeptical hypotheses engender. Pritchard argues that the ineliminability of reflective luck shows that we not only lack reflective knowledge that the skeptic’s hypotheses are false, we also lack reflective knowledge that our ordinary commonsense beliefs are true. If Pritchard is right, we may, indeed, possess a great deal of ordinary knowledge, but the ineliminability of reflective luck will forever preclude us from reflectively being able to tell that we do.

4. Conclusion

Reflecting on the nature and scope of epistemic luck gives us deeper insight into the nature and scope of knowledge. Gettier cases demonstrate that fallible justification is not capable of ruling out all forms of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck and that thus knowledge requires more than justified true belief. Just what anti-luck condition must be added justified true belief to arrive at an adequate analysis of knowledge remains an open question.

Recognizing which forms of epistemic luck are incompatible with knowledge and which are not puts us one step closer to identifying the correct luck-eliminating condition. It is now generally acknowledged that veritic luck is incompatible with knowledge. Whether other forms of epistemic luck, such as, justification-oriented luck, are incompatible with knowledge is a question that deserves more attention. At a minimum, any adequate theory of knowledge must be capable of ruling out all cases of veritic luck and to date no theory has been able to do so.

The possibility of knowledge-destroying veritic luck poses no special skeptical threat where first-order knowledge is concerned. As long as a person is not veritically lucky with respect to p, she will know that p, provided she has met the other conditions required for knowledge. The situation appears to be different where second-order knowledge is concerned. While there is no consensus to date as to how serious an obstacle the Gettier problem poses for second-order knowledge, it poses enough of an obstacle to such knowledge to render implausible the once widely held KK-thesis according to which knowing entails knowing that one knows.

Veritic luck is not the only form of epistemic luck that threatens more reflective forms of knowledge. Reflective luck also threatens to undermine the possibility of reflectively knowing that one knows. Our apparent inability to know, on the basis of reflection alone, that the skeptic’s radical hypotheses are false, together with the principle of  epistemic closure, threatens to undermine the possibility of reflective knowledge altogether.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Chisholm, Roderick. 1986. “The Place of Epistemic Justification.” Philosophical Topics 14: 85-92.
    • Argues that one cannot generally know that one knows on the grounds that one cannot generally know whether or not one’s evidence for p is defeated by Gettier considerations.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. 1964. “The Ethics of Requirement.” American Philosophical Quarterly 1: 147-153.
    • Provides a No Defeaters response to the Gettier problem.
  • Clarke, Michael. 1963. “Knowledge and Grounds: A Comment on Mr. Gettier’s Paper.” Analysis XXIV: 46-48.
    • Argues that No False Grounds is mistaken since S can derive a justified true belief that p from a justified true belief that q and still fail to know that p because S’s grounds for q are false. Contends that knowledge is “fully grounded” justified true belief, where in order to be fully grounded, the chain of reasons leading up to S’s proximate grounds for p must itself contain no false grounds at any point in the chain.
  • Coffman, E.J. 2007. “Thinking about Luck.” Synthese 158: 385-398.
    • Defends a lack of control account of luck.
  • Dretske, Fred. 1971. “Conclusive Reasons.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 49: 1-22.
    • Argues that in order to rule out knowledge-destroying luck, one’s reasons for p must be conclusive in the sense that one would not have had those reasons if p were false.
  • Engel Jr., Mylan. 2000. “Internalism, the Gettier Problem, and Metaepistemological Skepticism.” Grazer Philosophische Studien 60: 99-117.
    • Argues that the Gettier problem poses three distinct challenges to second-order knowledge which, when taken together, threaten to undermine the possibility of knowing that one knows.
  • Engel Jr., Mylan. 1992. “Is Epistemic Luck Compatible with Knowledge?” Southern Journal of Philosophy 30: 59-75.
    • Identifies veritic luck as the principal form of knowledge-destroying luck. Distinguishes veritic luck from evidential luck. Argues that, of these two types of luck, only veritic luck is incompatible with knowledge. Further argues that only externalist epistemologies are capable of ruling out veritic luck.
  • Feldman, Richard. 1981. “Fallibilism and Knowing that One Knows.” Philosophical Review XC: 266-282.
    • Defends the iterative KK-thesis. Argues that the Gettier problem poses a minor, but hardly insurmountable, obstacle to second-order knowledge.
  • Feldman, Richard. 1974. “An Alleged Defect in Gettier Counterexamples.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 52: 68-69.
    • Provides a decisive example of an all-true-evidence Gettier case that shows that No False Grounds is too weak.
  • Fumerton, Richard. 1995. Metaepistemology and Skepticism. Lanham, MA: Rowman and Littlefield Publishers.
    • Argues that second-order knowledge is too easy on externalistic accounts of knowledge and that, therefore, such accounts fail to capture the kind of knowledge that interests us.
  • Gettier, Edmund. 1963. “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” Analysis 23: 121-3.
    • Demonstrates that justified true belief is not sufficient for knowledge. Highlights two paradigm examples of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck.
  • Greco, John. 2004. “A Different Sort of Contextualism. Erkenntnis 61: 383-400.
    • Defends a contextualist virtue epistemology. Offers a situationalist account of veritic luck, that is, an account tied to one’s epistemic situation rather than to one’s evidence: S is veritically lucky in believing that p if and only if, given S’s epistemic situation, it is just a matter of luck that S’s belief that p is true.
  • Greco, John. 2003. “Virtue and Luck, Epistemic and Otherwise.” Metaphilosophy 34: 353-366.
    • Defends a virtue theoretic solution to the Gettier problem. Argues that when S has a true belief that p because S believes out of intellectual virtue (that is, when S’s believing out of intellectual virtue is what accounts for her have a true belief that p rather than a false belief or no belief), then S’s true belief that p is not veritically lucky.
  • Goldman, Alvin. 1979. “What Is Justified Belief?” In Justification and Knowledge. Ed. George Pappas. Dordrecht, Holland: D. Reidel Publishing Company.
    • Develops and defends an externalistic, process reliabilist account of justified belief.
  • Goldman, Alvin. 1967. “A Causal Theory of Knowing.” The Journal of Philosophy 64: 355-372.
    • Attempts to solve the Gettier problem by replacing the traditional justification condition with a causal constraint requiring that one’s belief that p be caused by the fact that makes p true.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 1973. Thought. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
    • Presents three much-discussed examples intended to show that knowledge can be undermined by readily available misleading evidence that one does not possess. Defends a No Essential False Grounds response to the Gettier problem.
  • Harper, William. 1996. “Knowledge and Luck.” Southern Journal of Philosophy 34: 273-283.
    • Demonstrates that the Gettier problem plagues all fallibilistic theories of justification, both internalistic and externalistic alike. Argues that in addition to the traditional justification, truth, and belief conditions, an adequate analysis of knowledge must incorporate a “no luck” condition.
  • Heller, Mark. 1999. “The Proper Role for Contextualism in an Anti-Luck Epistemology.” Philosophical Perspectives, 13, Epistemology: 115-29.
    • Proposes a context-sensitive modal account of epistemic luck according to which ‘S’s belief that p is epistemically lucky’ is true if and only if there is at least one world (in a contextually-determined set of epistemically relevant worlds) where S’s belief that p is false. Defends a contextualist anti-luck epistemology which maintains that ‘S knows that p’ is true if and only if there is no world (in a contextually-determined set of epistemically relevant worlds) where S’s belief that p is false.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2005. “Gettier Problems.” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • Canvasses various purported solutions to the Gettier problem. Concludes with the contentious suggestion that justified true belief is sufficient for knowledge and that veritically-lucky justified true beliefs, like those in Gettier’s original examples, are actually cases of knowledge.
  • Hiller, Avram and Ram Neta. 2007. “Safety and Epistemic Luck.” Synthese 158: 303-13.
    • Demonstrates that safe true belief is not sufficient for knowledge by providing an example of a veritically lucky safe true belief that clearly falls short of knowledge.
  • Klein, Peter. 2008. “Useful False Beliefs.” In Epistemology: New Essays. Ed. Quentin Smith. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Argues that there can be beneficial falsehoods—falsehoods essential to one’s justification—that nevertheless give one knowledge.
  • Klein, Peter. 1971. “A Proposed Definition of Propositional Knowledge.” Journal of Philosophy 68: 471-482.
    • Defends a No Defeaters solution to the Gettier problem.
  • Lackey, Jennifer. 2007. “Why We Don’t Deserve Credit for Everything We Know.” Synthese 158: 345-361.
    • Argues that knowledge is not credit-worthy true belief and that thus virtue theoretic accounts of knowledge are mistaken.
  • Lackey, Jennifer. 2006. “Pritchard’s Epistemic Luck.” The Philosophical Quarterly 56: 284-289.
    • Provides a counterexample to Pritchard’s modal account of luck.
  • Lehrer, Keith. 1990. Theory of Knowledge. Boulder, CO: Westview Press.
    • Defends a coherence theory of justification. Argues that knowledge is undefeated justified true acceptance.
  • Lehrer, Keith and Thomas Paxson Jr. 1969. “Knowledge: Undefeated Justified True Belief.” The Journal of Philosophy 66: 225-237.
    • Defends an alternative No Defeaters response to the Gettier problem. Introduces the Tom Grabit counterexample to the Chisholm/Klein account of defeaters.
  • Lycan, William. 1977. “Evidence One Does Not Possess.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 55: 114-26.
    • Argues that misleading evidence one does not possess does not undermine one’s knowledge and that, thus, Harman Cases are actually cases of knowledge.
  • Murphy, Peter. 2005. “Closure Failure for Safety.” Philosophia 33: 331-34.
    • Adapts Kripke’s famous “blue barn” counterexample to Nozick’s analysis of knowledge to show that safe true belief accounts of knowledge also result in closure failure.
  • Myers, Robert G. and Kenneth Stern. 1973. “Knowledge without Paradox.” Journal of Philosophy 70: 147-160.
    • Argues that p can justify S in believing some other proposition q only if p is true and that, thus, Gettier’s original cases do not provide examples of justified true beliefs that fall short of knowledge.
  • Nozick, Robert. 1981. “Knowledge and Skepticism.” In Philosophical Explanations. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Develops and defends a sensitivity-based subjunctive conditionals analysis of knowledge.
  • Plato: Theaetetus in Plato: Collected Dialogues. Eds. E. Hamilton and H. Cairns. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1961.
  • Pritchard, Duncan. 2005. Epistemic Luck. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Proposes a modal account of veritic luck. Argues that safety precludes veritic luck. Defends an externalist neo-Moorean safe true belief account of ordinary knowledge. Concedes to the skeptic that reflective luck is ineliminable and that such luck is incompatible with reflective knowledge.
  • Pritchard, Duncan. 2003. “Virtue Epistemology and Epistemic Luck.” Metaphilosophy 34: 106-30.
  • Pritchard, H.A. 1950. Knowledge and Perception. Oxford: The Clarendon Press.
  • Riggs, Wayne. 2007. “Why Epistemologists Are So Down on their Luck.” Synthese 158: 329-344.
    • Defends a lack of control account of luck. Argues that knowledge is credit-worthy true belief.
  • Roth, Michael. 1990. “The Wall and the Shield: K-K Reconsidered.” Philosophical Studies 59: 147-157.
    • Argues that the Gettier problem poses no obstacle to second-order knowledge on the grounds that Gettier-type contingencies lie safely outside the wall of fallibilism and can simply be ignored (unless they actually obtain).
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1912. The Problems of Philosophy. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
  • Skyrms, Brian. 1967. “The Explication of ‘X Knows that p’.” Journal of Philosophy 64: 373-389.
    • Provides one of the first cases of an all true evidence Gettier case.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2007. A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume 1. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
    • Develops and defends a virtue epistemology which maintains that knowledge is reliably-produced safe true belief, the correctness of which is attributable to one’s epistemic competence. Argues that when the correctness of a reliably-produced safe belief is attributable to the proper exercise of an epistemic competence, then the resultant belief is not epistemically lucky.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2000. “Skepticism and Contextualism.” Philosophical Issues, 10, Skepticism: 1-18.
    • Defends a non-contextualist safety-based Moorean response to the skeptical paradox.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 1999. “How to Defeat Opposition to Moore.” Philosophical Perspectives, 13, Epistemology: 141-54.
    • Develops a safety-based Moorean response to the skeptical paradox. Argues that such a response is preferable to skeptical, tracking, relevant-alternative, and contextualist accounts.
  • Steup, Matthias. 2006. “The Analysis of Knowledge.” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • Discusses the necessary conditions for knowledge. Examines internalistic and externalistic analyses of knowledge.
  • Swain, Marshall. 1981. Reasons and Knowledge. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Truncellito, David A. 2007. “Epistemology,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Unger, Peter. 1968. “An Analysis of Factual Knowledge.” Journal of Philosophy 65: 157-70.
    • Shows that various forms of epistemic luck – including propositional luck, existential luck, and facultative luck – are compatible with knowledge. Argues that knowledge is non-accidentally true belief.
  • Vahid, Hamid. 2001. “Knowledge and Varieties of Epistemic Luck.” Dialectica 55: 351-362.
    • Argues that truth-oriented veritic luck and justification-oriented luck are both incompatible with knowledge.
  • Vogel, Jonathan. 1999. “The New Relevant Alternatives Theory.” Philosophical Perspectives, 13, Epistemology: 155-80.
    • Uses Hole-in-One to argue that sensitivity is not necessary for knowledge.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2000a. “Scepticism and Evidence.” Philosophy and Phenomenal Research 60: 613-28.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2000b. Knowledge and Its Limits. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
  • Zagzebski, Linda. 1996. Virtues of the Mind. Cambridge, England: Cambridge University Press.
    • Characterizes Gettier-style knowledge-destroying luck as cases of “double luck” where epistemic bad luck is cancelled out by epistemic good luck. Argues that no fallibilist epistemology can rule out knowledge-destroying luck. Defends a virtue-based epistemology according to which knowledge is a state of cognitive contact with reality arising out of acts of intellectual virtue, and argues that this definition of knowledge is immune to the Gettier problem because truth is entailed by the other components of the definition.


Author Information

Mylan Engel Jr.
Northern Illinois University
U. S. A.