Frankfurt School and Critical Theory

The Frankfurt School and Critical Theory

The Frankfurt School, also known as the Institute of Social Research (Institut für Sozialforschung), is a social and political philosophical movement of thought located in Frankfurt am Main, Germany. It is the original source of what is known as Critical Theory. The Institute was founded, thanks to a donation by Felix Weil in 1923, with the aim of developing Marxist studies in Germany. The Institute eventually generated a specific school of thought after 1933 when the Nazis forced it to close and move to the United States, where it found hospitality at Columbia University, New York.

The academic influence of the “critical” method is far reaching in terms of educational institutions in which such tradition is taught and in terms of the problems it addresses. Some of its core issues involve the critique of modernities and of capitalist society, the definition of social emancipation and the perceived pathologies of society. Critical theory provides a specific interpretation of Marxist philosophy and reinterprets some of its central economic and political notions such as commodification, reification, fetishization and critique of mass culture.

Some of the most prominent figures of the first generation of Critical Theorists are Max Horkheimer (1895-1973), Theodor Adorno (1903-1969), Herbert Marcuse (1898-1979), Walter Benjamin (1892-1940), Friedrich Pollock (1894-1970), Leo Lowenthal (1900-1993), Eric Fromm (1900-1980). Since the 1970s, the second generation has been led by Jürgen Habermas who has greatly contributed to fostering the dialogue between the so called “continental” and “analytical” tradition. This phase has also been substantiated by the works of Klaus Günther, Hauke Brunkhorst, Ralf Dahrendorf, Gerhard Brandt, Alfred Schmidt, Claus Offe, Oskar Negt, Albrecht Wellmer and Ludwig von Friedeburg, Lutz Wingert, Josef Früchtl, Lutz-Bachman. More generally, it is possible to speak of a “third generation” of critical theorists, symbolically represented in Germany by the influential work of Axel Honneth. The philosophical impact of the school has been worldwide. Early in the first decade of the twenty-first century, a fourth generation of critical theory scholars emerged and coalesced around Rainer Forst.

The “first generation” of critical theorists was largely occupied with the functional and conceptual re-qualification of Hegel’s dialectics. After Habermas, preference has been assigned to the understanding of the conditions of action coordination through the underpinning of the conditions of validity for speech-acts. The third generation, then, following the works of Honneth, turned back to Hegel’s philosophy and in particular to Hegel’s notion of “recognition” as a cognitive and pre-linguistic sphere grounding intersubjectivity.

Table of Contents

  1. Critical Theory: Historical and Philosophical Background
  2. What is Critical Theory?
    1. Traditional and Critical Theory: Ideology and Critique
    2. The Theory/Practice Problem
    3. The Idea of Rationality: Critical Theory and its Discontents
  3. Concluding Thoughts
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Critical Theory: Historical and Philosophical Background

Felix Weil’s father Herman made his fortune exporting grain from Argentina to Europe. In 1923 Felix convinced him to spend some of it financing an institute devoted to the study of society in the light of the Marxist tradition. At this point, Felix could not have foreseen that in the 1960s the University of Frankfurt, to which the institute was attached, would receive the epithet “Karl Marx University”. The initial idea of an independently founded institute was conceived to provide for studies on the labor movement and the origins of anti-Semitism, which at the time were being ignored in German intellectual and academic life

Not long after its inception, the Institute for Social Research was formally recognized by the Ministry of Education as an entity attached to Frankfurt University. The first official appointed director was Carl Grünberg (1923-9), a Marxist legal and political professor at the University of Vienna. His contribution to the Institute was the creation of an historical archive mainly oriented to the study of the labor movement (also known as the Grünberg Archiv).

In 1930, Max Horkheimer succeeded Grünberg. While continuing the Marxist inspiration, Horkheimer interpreted the Institute’s mission to be more directed towards an interdisciplinary integration of the social sciences. Additionally, the Grünberg Archiv ceased to publish, and instead a different official organ was launched which was to have a much greater impact: the Zeitschrift für Sozialforschung. While never officially supporting any party, the Institute entertained intensive research exchanges with the Soviet Union.

It was under Horkheimer’s leadership that members of the Institute were able to address a wide variety of economic, social, political and aesthetic topics, ranging from empirical analysis to philosophical theorization. Different interpretations of Marxism and its historical applications explain some of the hardest confrontations on economic themes within the Institute, such as the case of Pollock’s criticism of Grossman’s standard view on the pauperization of capitalism. This particular confrontation led Grossman to leave the Institute. Pollock’s critical reinterpretation of Marx also received support from intellectuals who greatly contributed to the later development of the School: for instance, Leo Lowenthal, Theodor Wiesengrund-Adorno and Erich Fromm. In particular, with Fromm’s development of a psychoanalytic trend at the Institute and with an influential philosophical contribution by Hokheimer, it became clear how under his directorship the Institute faced a drastic turning point characterizing all its future endeavors. In the following, I shall briefly introduce some of the main research patterns introduced by Fromm and Horkheimer respectively.

From the beginning, psychoanalysis in the Frankfurt School was conceived in terms of a reinterpretation of Freud and Marx. Its consideration in the School was clearly due to Horkheimer, who encouraged his researchers to direct their attention to the subject. It was Fromm, nevertheless, who best produced an advancement of the discipline; his central aim was to provide, through a synthesis of Marxism and psychoanalysis, “the missing link between ideological superstructure and socio-economic base” (Jay 1966, p. 92). There was a radical shift in the conjunction of the School’s interests and psychoanalysis with the coeval entrance of Adorno and Fromm’s departure in the late 1930s. Nevertheless, the School retained psychoanalysis, and in particular Freud’s instinct theory, as an area of interest. This can be seen in Adorno’s later paper “Social Science and Sociological Tendencies in Psychoanalysis” (1946), as well as Marcuse’s book Eros and Civilization (1955). The School’s interest in psychoanalysis was characterized by the total abandonment of Marxism as well as by a progressive interest into the relation of psychoanalysis with social change and the maintenance of Fromm’s insight into the psychic (or even psychotic) role of the family. This interest became crucial in empirical studies in 1940, which culminated in Adorno’s co-authored work The Authoritarian Personality (1950).  The goal of this work was to explore, on the basis of submission of a questionnaire, a “new anthropological type” - the authoritarian personality (Adorno et al. 1950, quoted in Jay 1996, p. 239). Such a character was found to have specific traits, such as, among others: compliance with conventional values, non-critical thinking, an absence of introspectiveness.

(As pointed out by Jay: “Perhaps some of the confusion about this question was a product of terminological ambiguity. As a number of commentators have pointed out, there is an important distinction that should be drawn between authoritarianism and totalitarianism [emphasis added]. Wilhelminian and Nazi Germany, for example, were fundamentally dissimilar in their patterns of obedience. What The Authoritarian Personality was really studying was the character type of a totalitarian rather than an authoritarian society. Thus, it should have been no surprise to learn that this new syndrome was fostered by a familial crisis in which traditional paternal authority was under fire” (Jay 1996, p. 247).)

Horkheimer’s leadership provided a very distinct methodological direction and philosophical grounding to the Institute’s research interests. Against the so-called Lebensphilosophie (philosophy of life), he criticized the fetishism of subjectivity and the lack of consideration for the materialist conditions of life. Furthermore, arguing against Cartesian and Kantian philosophy, he attempted to rejoin all dichotomies - like those between consciousness and being, theory and practice, fact and value - through the use of dialectical mediation. Differently from Hegelism or Marxism though, dialectics for Horkheimer amounted to neither a metaphysical principle nor a historical praxis; it was not intended as a methodological instrument. On the contrary, Horkheimer’s dialectics functioned as the battleground for overcoming categorical fixities and oppositions. From this descended Horkheimer’s criticism of orthodox Marxism which dichotomized the opposition between productive structures and ideological superstructure, or positivism’s naïve separation of social facts from their social interpretation.

In 1933, due to the Nazi takeover, the Institute temporarily transferred first to Geneva and then in 1935 to New York and Columbia University. Two years later Horkheimer published the ideological manifesto of the School in his  “Traditional and Critical Theory” ([1937] 1976), where some of the already anticipated topics were addressed, such as the practical and critical turn of theory. In 1938 Adorno joined the Institute after spending time at Merton College, Oxford as an “advanced student.” He was invited by Horkheimer to join the Princeton Radio Research Project together with Lazarsfeld. Gradually, Adorno assumed a preponderant intellectual role in the School, culminating in the co-publication, with Horkheimer, of one of the milestones of Critical Theory: Dialectic of Enlightenment in 1947. During this time, while Germany was under Nazi seizure, the Institute remained the only free voice publishing in German. The backlash of this choice, though, was a prolonged isolation from American academic life and intellectual debate, a situation which Adorno appealed against iconoclastically as “a message in the bottle” for the lack of a public target. According to Wiggershaus: “The Institute disorientation in the late 1930s made the balancing acts it had always had to perform, for example in relation to its academic environment, even more difficult. The seminars were virtually discussion groups for the Institute’s associates, and American students only rarely took part in them” (1995, p. 251).

Interestingly, one of the School’s major topics of study was Nazism. This led to two different approaches in the School. One was guided by Neumann, Gurland and Kirchheimer and addressed mainly legal and political issues on the basis of economic substructures. The other, guided by Horkheimer, focused on psychological irrationalism as a source of obedience and domination (see Jay 1996, p. 166).

In 1941, Horkheimer moved to Pacific Palisades, near Los Angeles. He built himself a bungalow near other German intellectuals, among whom were Bertold Brecht and Thomas Mann, and those working for the film industry or aiming at doing so (Wiggershaus 1995, p. 292). Other fellows like Marcuse, Pollock and Adorno followed shortly, whereas some remained in New York. Only Benjamin refused to leave Europe and, while attempting to cross the border between France and Spain at Port Bou, committed suicide in 1940. Some months later Arendt also crossed the border there, passing on to Adorno Benjamin’s last writing, “Theses on the Philosophy of History”.

The internal division of the School between its bases in New York and California, was accompanied by a progressive distinction of research programs led respectively by Pollock on anti-Semitism from the east coast, culminating in a four-volume work titled Studies in Anti-Semitism as well as an international conference in 1944; and a trend of studies on dialectics from the west coast led by Horkheimer and Adorno. Even during these years the latter engaged in the study of anti-semitic tendencies as several publications showed, such as The Authoritarian Personality or Studies in Prejudice. After this period, only few devoted supporters of the School remained there: Horkheimer himself, Pollock, Adorno, Lowenthal, and Weil. In 1946, however, the Institute was officially invited to rejoin Frankfurt University.

Returning to West Germany, Horkheimer presented his inaugural speech for the reopening of the institute on 14 November 1951, and one week later inaugurated the academic year as a new rector of Frankfurt University. Nevertheless what was once a lively intellectual community became a small team of a few but very busy people, with Horkheimer involved in the administration of the university and Adorno occupied with different projects and teachings. In addition, due to the maintenance of US citizenship, Adorno had to go back to California, where he earned his living from qualitative analysis research. From his side, Horkheimer attempted to attract back his former assistant Marcuse when the opportunity arose for a successor to Gadamer’s chair in Frankfurt, but neither this initiative nor further occasions were successful. Marcuse remained in the United States and was offered a full position by Brandeis University. Adorno returned to Germany in August 1953 and was soon involved again in empirical research combining quantitative and qualitative methods in the analysis of industrial relations for the Mannesmann Company. Then in 1955, he took over Horkheimer’s position as director of the Institute for Social Research, and on 1 July 1957 he was appointed full professor in philosophy and sociology. Adorno’s most innovative contribution was thought to be in the field of music theory and aesthetics, where some of his significant works included Philosophy of Modern Music (1949) and later “Vers une Musique Informelle”. In 1956 Horkheimer retired just as several important publications emerged, such as Marcuse’s Eros and Civilization and the essay collection Sociologica. These events gave character to the precise research phase reached by the “Frankfurt School” and “Critical Theory”.

The sixties – which saw famous student protests across Europe – also saw the publication of Adorno’s fundamental work, Negative Dialectics (1966). While far from being conceived either in terms of materialism or of metaphysics, this maintained important connections with an “open and non systemic” notion of dialectics. Marcuse had just published One-Dimensional Man (1964), introducing the notion of “educational dictatorship”, which implied that for the sake of liberation there was a need for the advancement of material conditions for the realization of a higher notion of “the good”. While Marcuse quite ostensibly sponsored the student upheavals, Adorno maintained a much more moderate and critical profile.

In 1956, Habermas joined the Institute as Adorno’s assistant, and was soon involved in an empirical and cooperative study under the title of Students and Politics. The text, though, was rejected by Horkheimer and did not come out, as it should have, in the series Frankfurt Contributions to Sociology, but only later in 1961 in the series Sociological Texts, by the publisher Luchterhand (see Wiggershaus 1995, p. 555). Horkheimer’s aversion towards Habermas was even more evident when he was refused supervision on his habilitation. In the event, Habermas undertook his habilitation, on the topic of the bourgeois’ public sphere, under the supervision of Abendroth at Marburg. As a result of his previous studies, in 1962 Habermas published The Structural Transformation of the Public Sphere, and in the same year, just before his habilitation and thanks to Gadamer, he was appointed as professor at Heidelberg. Besides his academic achievements, as an activist the young Habermas contributed towards a critical self-awareness of the socialist student groups around the country (the so-called SDS, Sozialistischer Deutscher Studentenbund). It was in this context that Habermas had to deal with the extremism of Rudi Dutschke, the students’ radical leader who criticized him for defending a non-effective emancipatory view. Discussion of the notion of “emancipation” has been at the center of the Frankfurt School’s political contention and of its philosophical debates. For the sake of clarification, it must be said that the German word “Befreiung”, covers a much wider semantic spectrum than “emancipation;” its most recurrent use in German philosophical works is that of “liberation”, which implies either a transformative or even a revolutionary action. Due to the plasticity of “Befreiung”, Critical Theory scholars engaged into a far reaching process of conceptual and political clarification; accordingly, it was principally against Dutschke’s positions that Habermas, during a public assembly, labeled such positions with the epitome “left-wing fascism”. How representative this expression is of Habermas’ views on students’ protests has often been a matter of contention, even though this reaction cannot be taken to encompass the complexity of the Habermasian position respect to the students’ liberation movement.

After his nomination in 1971 as a director of the Max Planck Institut for Research into the Conditions of Life in the Scientific-Technical World at Starnberg, Habermas left Frankfurt, returning there in 1981 after the completion of one of his masterpieces, The Theory of Communicative Action. This decade was crucial for the definition of the School’s research objectives as well as most of the fundamental research achievements of the so-called “second generation” of Frankfurt scholars. In his two-volume work The Theory of Communicative Action (1984b [1981]), Habermas provided a model of social complexities and action coordination based upon the original interpretation of classical social theorists as well as contemporary philosophy of language such as Searle’s Speech Acts theory. Within this work, it also became evident how the large amount of empirical work conducted by Habermas’ research team on topics concerning pathologies of society, moral development and so on, was elevated to a functionalistic model of society oriented to an emancipatory purpose. This normative force can be detected from within language itself, in what Habermas defined as the “unavoidable pragmatic presuppositions of mutual understanding”. Social action, therefore, whose coordination function relies on the same pragmatic presuppositions, gets connected to a justification for the validity of claims.

Habermas describes discourse theory as characterized by three types of validity-claims raised by communicative acts: it is only when the conditions of truth, rightness and sincerity are raised by speech-acts that social coordination is obtained. In contrast to the closeness of the German intellectual world characterizing most of the first generation of Frankfurt scholars, Habermas contributed greatly to bridge the continental and analytical traditions, integrating prospects belonging to American Pragmatism, Anthropology and Semiotics with Marxism and Critical Social Theory.

Just one year before Habermas’ retirement in 1994, the directorship of the Institut für Sozialforschung was assumed by Honneth. This inaugurated a new phase of Critical Theory, both in terms of generation (the third generation) and in terms of philosophical research as Honneth revived the Hegelian notion of recognition (Anerkennung) in social and political enquiry. Honneth began his collaboration with Habermas in 1984, when he was hired as assistant professor. After a period of academic appointments in Berlin and Konstanz, in 1996 he took Habermas’ chair in Frankfurt.

Honneth’s central tenet, the struggle for recognition, represents a leitmotiv finding wide discussion in The Struggle for Recognition: The Moral Grammar of Social Conflicts ([1986]), certainly one of Honneth’s greatest texts. This work is a mature expansion of what was partially addressed in his dissertation, a work published under the title of Critique of Power: Stages of Reflection of a Critical Social Theory (1991 [1985]). One of the core themes addressed by Honneth is that, contrary to what Critical Theory had emphasized so far, more attention should be paid to the notion of conflict in society and among societal groups. Such conflict represents the internal movement of historical advancement and human emancipation, falling therefore within the core theme of critical social theory. The so-called “struggle for recognition” is what best characterizes the fight for emancipation by social groups, and this fight represents a subjective negative experience of domination – a form of domination attached to misrecognitions. To come to terms with such negations of subjective forms of self-realization means to be able to transform social reality. Normatively, though, acts of social struggle activated by forms of misrecognition point to the role that recognition plays as a crucial criterion for grounding intersubjectivity.

Honneth inaugurated a new research phase in Critical Theory. Indeed, his communitarian turn of social theory has been paralleled by the work of some of his fellow scholars. Brunkhorst, for instance, in his Solidarity: From Civic Friendship to a Global Legal Community (2005 [2002]), canvasses a line of thought springing from the French Revolution of 1789 to contemporary times, which has been still insufficiently explored so far: the notion of fraternity. By the use of historical conceptual reconstruction and normative speculation, Brunkhorst presents the pathologies of the contemporary globalized world and the function that “solidarity” would play.

The confrontation with American debate initiated systematically by the work of Habermas has become then normal practice during the third generation of critical social theorists. Additionally since Habermas, the third generation has engaged in dialogue with French post-modern philosophers like Derrida, Baudrillard, Lyotard, and so forth, which according to Foucault are legitimate interpreters of some central instances of the Frankfurt School.

2. What is Critical Theory?

“What is ‘theory’?” asks Horkheimer in the opening of his essay Traditional and Critical Theory [1937]. The discussion about method, has been always a constant topic for those critical theorists who, since the beginning, have attempted to clarify the specificity of what it means for social theory to be “critical”. A primary broad distinction that Horkheimer drew was that of the difference in method between social theories, scientific theories and critical social theories. While the first two categories have been treated as instances of traditional theories, the latter connoted the methodology the Frankfurt School adopted.

Traditional theory, whether deductive or analytical, has always focused on coherency and on the strict distinction between theory and praxis. Along Cartesian lines, knowledge was treated as being grounded upon self-evident propositions, or at least upon propositions derivable from self-evident truths. Traditional theory proceeded to explain facts through the application of universal laws, so that by the subsumption of a particular into the universal, law was either confirmed or disconfirmed. A verificationist procedure of this kind was what positivism has considered to be the best explicatory account for the notion of praxis in scientific investigation. If one were to defend the view according to which scientific truths, in order to be considered so, should pass the test of empirical confirmation, then he would commit himself to the idea of an objective world. Knowledge would be simply a mirror of reality. This point is firmly refused by Critical Theory.

Under several aspects, what Critical Theory wants to reject in traditional theory is precisely this “picture theory” of language and knowledge widely presented originally in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus. According to such view, later abandoned by Wittgenstein himself, the logical form of propositions consists in “showing” a possible fact and in “saying” whether this is true or false. For example, the proposition “it rains today”, shows both the possibility of the fact that “it rains today”, and says that it is actually the case that “it rains today.” In order to check whether something is or is not the case, I have to verify empirically whether it occurs or not. This implies that the condition of truth and falsehood presupposes an objective structure of the world.

Horkheimer and his followers rejected the notion of objectivity in knowledge by pointing, among other things, to the fact that the object of knowledge is itself embedded into an historical and social process: “The facts which our sense present to us are socially preformed in two ways: through the historical character of the object perceived and through the historical character of the perceiving organ” (Horkheimer [1937] in Ingram and Simon-Ingram 1992, p. 242). Further, with a rather Marxian tone, Horkheimer noticed also that phenomenical objectivity is a myth because it is dependent upon “technological conditions” and that the latter is sensitive of the material conditions of production. Critical Theory thus wants to abandon naïve conceptions of knowledge-impartiality. Since intellectuals themselves are not disembodied entities reflecting from outside, knowledge can be obtained only from within a society of interdependent individuals.

If traditional theory is evaluated in accordance with its practical implications, then no practical consequences can be inferred. As a matter of fact, the finality of knowledge as a mirror of reality is mainly theoretically oriented and aimed at separating knowledge from action, speculation from social transformative enterprise. On the contrary, Critical Theory characterizes itself as a method which does not “fetishize” knowledge, considering it rather functional to ideology critique and social emancipation. In the light of such finalities, knowledge becomes social criticism, and the latter translates itself into social action, that is, into the transformation of reality.

Critical Theory has been strongly influenced by Hegel’s notion of dialectics, the latter aimed at reconciling socio-historical oppositions, as well as by Marx’s theory of economy and society and the limits of Hegel’s “bourgeois philosophy”. Critical Theory, indeed, has expanded Marxian criticisms of capitalist society, by formulating patterns of social emancipatory strategies. Whereas Hegel found that Rationality had finally come to terms with Reality through the birth of the modern national state (which in his eyes was the Prussian state), Marx insisted on the necessity of reading the development of rationality through history as a struggle of social classes. The final stage of this struggle would have seen the political and economic empowerment of the proletariat. Critical theorists, in their turn, rejected both the metaphysical apparatus of Hegel and the eschatological aspects connected to Marx’s theory. On the contrary, Critical Theory analyses, oriented to the understanding of society, pointed rather to the necessity of establishing open systems of analysis based on an immanent form of social criticism. Their starting point was the Marxian view on the relation between a system of production paralleled by a system of beliefs. Ideology, which according to Marx, was totally explicable through the underlying system of production, had, for critical theorists, to be analyzed in its own respect and as a non-economically reducible form of expression of human rationality. Such a revision of Marxian categories became extremely crucial, then, in the reinterpretation of the notion of dialectic for the analysis of capitalism. In the light of this, dialectic, as a method of social criticism, was interpreted as following from the contradictory nature of capitalism as a system of exploitation. Indeed, it was on the basis of such inherent contradictions that capitalism was seen to open up to a collective form of ownership of the means of production, that is, socialism.

a. Traditional and Critical Theory: Ideology and Critique

From these conceptually rich implications one can observe some of the constant topics which have characterized critical social theory – that is, the normativity of social philosophy as something distinct from classical descriptive sociology, the everlasting crux on the theory/practice relation, or even ideology criticism. These are the primary tasks that a critical social theory must accomplish in order to be defined as “critical.” Crucial in this sense is the understanding and the criticism of the notion of “ideology”.

In defining the senses to be assigned to the notion of ideology, within its descriptive-empirical sense “one might study the biological and quasi-biological properties of the group” or, alternatively, “the cultural or socio-cultural features of the group” (Geuss 1981, p. 4 ff). Ideology, in the descriptive sense, incorporates both “discursive” and “non-discursive” elements. That is, in addition to propositional contents or performatives, it includes gestures, ceremonies, and so forth (Geuss 1981, pp. 6-8); also, it shows a systematic set of beliefs - a world-view - characterized by conceptual schemes. A variant of the descriptive sense is the “pejorative” version, where a form of ideology is judged negatively in view of its epistemic, functional or genetic properties (Geuss 1981, p. 13).  On the other hand, if one takes “ideology” according to a positive sense, then, he is not dealing with something empirically given, but rather with a “desideratum”, a “verité a faire” (Geuss 1981, p. 23). Critical Theory, though, distinguishes itself from scientific theories tout court, since while the latter produce a sort of objectified knowledge, the former serves the purpose of human emancipation through consciousness and self-reflection.

If the task of critical social theory is that of evaluating the rationality of any system of social domination in view of certain standards of justice, then ideological criticism has the function of unmasking wrong rationalizations of present or past injustices – that is, ideology in the factual and negative sense - such as in the case of the belief that “women are inferior to men, or blacks to whites…”. Thus ideological criticism has the function of proposing alternative practicable ways for constructing the social bound. Critical Theory moves precisely in between the contingency of objectified non-critical factual reality and the normativity of utopian idealizations, that is, within the so-called “theory/practice” problem (see Ingram 1990, p. xxiii). Marcuse, for instance, in the essay Philosophie und kritische Theorie (1937), defends the view that Critical Theory characterizes itself as being neither philosophy tout court, nor pure science as overly simplistic Marxism claims. Critical Theory has easier tasks: that of clarifying the sociopolitical determinants explaining the limits of analysis of a certain philosophical view, as well as that of transcending the use of imagination - the actual limits of imagination. From all this, two notions of “rationality” result: the first attached to the dominant form of power and deprived of any normative force; the second characterized, on the contrary, by a liberating force based on a yet-to-come scenario. This difference in forms of rationality is what Habermas later presented, mutatis mutandis, as the distinction between “instrumental” and “communicative” rationality. While the first is oriented to a means-ends understanding of human and environmental relations, the second is oriented to subordinating human action to the respect of certain normative criteria of action validity. This latter point echoes quite distinctively Kant’s principle of morality according to which human beings must be always treated as “ends in themselves” and never as mere “means”. Critical Theory, and Habermas in particular, are no exception towards such a double layer of rationality, since they both see Ideologiekritik not just as a form of “moralizing criticism”, but as a form of knowledge, that is as a cognitive operation for disclosing the falsity of conscience (Geuss 1981, p. 26).

This point is strictly connected to another conceptual category playing a great role within Critical Theory, the concept of “interest” and in particular the distinction between “true interests” and “false interests”. As Geuss suggests, there are two possible ways to make such a separation: “the perfect-knowledge approach” and “the optimal conditions approach” (1981, p. 48). Were one to follow the first option, the outcome would be that of falling into the side of acritical utopianism. On the contrary, “the optimal conditions approach” is reinterpreted, at least in Habermas, in terms of an “ideal speech situation” which, by virtually granting an all-encompassing exchange of arguments, assumes the function of providing a counterfactual normative check on actual discursive contexts. Within such a model, therefore, epistemic knowledge and social critical reflection are attached to unavoidable pragmatic-transcendental conditions that are universally the same for all.

The universality of such epistemological status differs profoundly from Adorno’s contextualism where individual epistemic principles grounding cultural criticism and self-reflection are recognized to be legitimately different in accordance to time and history. Both versions are “critical” in that they remain faithful to the objective of clearing false consciousness from ignorance and domination; but whereas Habermas sets a high standard of validity/non-validity for discourse theory, Adorno’s historicism is oriented towards “degrees” of rationality that are variable according to contexts. In one of his late 1969 writings  (republished in Adorno 2003, pp. 292 ff.), Adorno provides a short but dense interpretation in the form of eight theses on the significance and the mission of Critical Theory. The central message is that Critical Theory while drawing from Marxism, must avoid hypostatization and closure into a single Weltanschauung on the pain of losing its “critical” capacity. By interpreting rationality as a form of self-reflective activity, Critical Theory represents a particular form of rational enquiry capable of distinguishing, immanently, “ideology” from Hegelian “Spirit”. The mission of Critical Theory, though, is not exhausted by a theoretical understanding of the social reality; as a matter of fact, there is a strict interconnection between critical understanding and transformative action: theory and practice are interconnected.

b. The Theory/Practice Problem

During the course of its history, Critical Theory has always confronted itself with one crucial methodological problem: the “theory/practice” problem. To this issue critical theorists have provided different answers, so that it is not possible to organize a homogeneous set of views. In order to understand what the significance of the theory/practice problem is, one must refer back to David Hume’s “is/ought” question. What Hume demonstrated through the separation of the “is” from the “ought” was the non-derivability of prescriptive statements from descriptive ones. This separation has been at the basis of those ethical theories that have not recognized moral statements as a truth-property. In other words, according to the reading provided to the “is/ought” relation, it follows that either a cognitivist approach (truth-validity of moral statements), or a non-cognitivist approach is defended (no truth-validity), as in the case of the thesis according to which moral statements simply “express” an attitude (expressivism).

Even if characterized by several internal differences, what Critical Theory added to this debate was the consideration both of the anthropological as well as the psychological dynamics motivating masses and structuring ideologies.

As far as the anthropological determinants in closing up the gap of the “theory/practice” problem is concerned, one can consider Habermas’ Knowledge and Human Interest ([1968] 1971). There Habermas combines a transcendental argument with an anthropological one by defending the view according to which humans have an interest in knowledge insofar as such interest is attached to the preservation of self-identity. Yet, to preserve one’s identity is to go beyond mere compliance with biological survival, as Habermas clarifies: “[…] human interests […] derive both from nature and from the cultural break with nature” (Habermas [1968], in Ingram and Simon-Ingram,1992, p. 263). On the contrary, to preserve one’s identity means to see, in the emancipatory force of knowledge, the fundamental interest of human beings. Indeed, the grounding of knowledge into the practical domain has quite far-reaching implications, as for instance that interest and knowledge, in Habermas, find their unity in self-reflection, that is, in “knowledge for the sake of knowledge” (Habermas [1968], in Ingram and Simon-Ingram 1992, p. 264).

The Habermasian answer to the theory/practice problem comes from his criticism of non-cognitivist theories. If it is true, as non-cognitivists claim, that prescriptive claims are grounded on commands and do not have any cognitive content which can be justified through an exchange of public arguments, it follows that they cannot provide an answer to the difference between what is a “convergent behavior”, established through normative power on the basis, for example, of punishment, and what is instead “following a valid rule”. In the latter case, there seems to be required an extra layer of justification, namely, a process through which a norm can be defined as “valid”. Such process is for Habermas conceived in terms of a counterfactual procedure for a discursive exchange of arguments. This procedure is aimed at justifying those “generalizable interests” that ought to be obeyed because they pass the test of moral validity.

The Habermasian answer to the “is/ought” question has several important implications. One, and maybe the most important, is the criticism of positivism and of the epistemic status of knowledge. On the basis of Habermasian premises, indeed, there can be no objective knowledge, as positivists claim, detached from intersubjective forms of understanding. Since knowledge is strictly embedded in serving human interests, it follows that it cannot be considered value-neutral and objectively independent.

A further line of reflection on the “theory/practice” problem comes from psychoanalysis. In such cases, the outcomes have maintained a strict separation between the “is” and “ought”, and of unmasked false “oughts” through the clarification of the psychological mechanisms constructing desires. Accordingly, critical theorists like Fromm referred to Freud’s notions of the unconscious which contributed defining ideologies in terms of “substitute gratifications”. Psychoanalysis represented such a strong component within the research of the Frankfurt School that even Adorno in his article Freudian Theory and the Pattern of Fascist Propaganda (1951) analyzed Fromm’s interconnection between sadomasochism and fascism. Adorno noticed how a parallel can be drawn between the loss of self-confidence and estimation in hierarchical domination and a compensation through self-confidence which can be re-obtained in active forms of dominations. Such mechanisms of sadomasochism, though, are not only proper of fascism. As Adorno noticed, they reappear under different clothes in modern cultural industry through the consumption of so-called “cultural commodities”.

Notwithstanding the previous discussions, the greatest philosophical role of psychoanalysis within Frankfurt School was exemplified by Marcuse’s thought. In his case, the central problem became that of interpreting the interest genealogy at the basis of capitalist ideology. But how can one provide an account of class interests after the collapse of classes? How can one formulate, on the basis of the insight provided by psychoanalysis, the criteria through which it can distinguish true from false interests? The way adopted by Marcuse was with a revisitation of Freud’s theory of instinctual needs. Differently from Freud’s tensions between nature and culture and Fromm’s total social shaping of natural instincts, Marcuse defended a third – median – perspective where instincts were considered only partially shaped by social relations (Ingram 1990, p. 93 ff). Through such a solution, Marcuse overcame the strict opposition between biological and historical rationality preventing the resolution of the theory/practice problem. He did so by recalling the annihilation of individual’s sexual energy at the basis of organized society, recalling in its turn the archetypical scenario of a total fulfillment of pleasure. Imagination is taken by Marcuse as a way to obtain individual reconciliation with social reality, a reconciliation, though, which hid his underlying unresolved tension. Marcuse conceived of overcoming such tensions through the aestheticization of basic instincts liberated through the work of imagination. The problem with Marcuse’s rationalization of basic instincts was that by relying excessively on human biology it became impossible to distinguish between the truth or falsity of socially dependent needs (see on this Ingram 1990, p. 103).

c. The Idea of Rationality: Critical Theory and its Discontents

For Critical Theory, rationality has always been a crucial theme in the analysis of modern society as well as of its pathologies. Whereas the early Frankfurt School and Habermas viewed rationality as a historical process whose unity was taken as a precondition for social criticism, later critical philosophies influenced mainly by post-modernity privileged a rather more fragmented notion of (ir)rationality manifested by social institutions. In the latter, social criticism did not represent a self-reflective form of rationality since rationality was not conceived as an incorporated process of history. One point shared by all critical theorists was that forms of social pathology were connected to deficits of rationality, which in their turn manifested interconnections with the psychological status of the mind (see Honneth 2004, p. 339 ff.).

In non-pathological social aggregations, individuals should be capable of achieving cooperative forms of self-actualizations only if freed from coercive mechanisms of domination. Accordingly, for the Frankfurt School, modern processes of bureaucratic administration exemplified what Weber had already considered as an all-encompassing domination of formal rationality over substantive values. In Weber, rationality is to be interpreted as “purposive rationality”, that is, as a form of instrumental reason. Accordingly, the use of reason does not amount to formulating prescriptive models of society but aims at achieving goals through the selection of the best possible means of action. If in Lukács the proletariat was to represent the only dialectical way out from the total control of formal rationality, Horkheimer and Adorno saw technological domination of human action as the negation of the inspiring purposes of Enlightenment. In their most important work - Dialectic of Enlightenment (1969 [1947]) – they emphasized the role of knowledge and technology as a “means of exploitation” of labor, and viewed the dialectic of reason as the archetypical movement of human self-liberation. Nevertheless, the repression by formal-instrumental rationality of natural chaos has had as a consequence that of determining a resurgence of natural violence under a different form, so that the liberation from nature through instrumental reason has led to domination by a totalitarian state (see Ingram 1990, p. 63).

According to this view, reason is essentially a form of control over nature which has characterized humanity since its beginning, that is, since those attempts aimed at providing a mythological explanation of cosmic forces. The purpose served by such instrumental rationality was essentially that of promoting self-preservation, even if this paradoxically turned into the fragmentation of bourgeois individuality which, once deprived of any substantive value, became merely formal and thus determined by external influences of “mass-identity” in a context of “cultural industry”.

Rationality thus began to assume a double significance: on the one hand, as traditionally recognized by German idealism, it was conceived as the primary source of human emancipation; on the other, it was conceived as the premise of totalitarianism. If, as Weber believed, modern rationalization of society came to a formal reduction of the power of rationality, it followed that hyper-bureaucratization of society led not just to a complete separation between facts and values, but also to a total disinterest in the latter. Nevertheless, for Critical Theory it remained essential to defend the validity of social criticism on the basis of the idea that humanity is embedded in a historical learning process, where clash is due to the actualization of reason re-establishing a power balance and to struggles for group domination.

Given such general framework on rationality, it can be said that Critical Theory today has undergone several “internal” and “external” reformulations and criticisms. First of all, Habermas himself has suggested a further “pre-linguistic” line of enquiry making appeal to the notion of “authenticity” and “imagination”, so to suggest a radical reformulation of the same notion of “truth” and “reason” in the light of its metaphorical capacities of signification (see Habermas 1984a). Secondly, the commitment of Critical Theory to universal validity and universal pragmatics has been widely criticized by post-structuralists and post-modernists who have instead insisted respectively on the hyper-contextualism of the forms of linguistic rationality, as well as on the substitution of a criticism of ideology with genealogical criticism. While Derrida’s “deconstructive method” has shown how binary opposition collapses when applied to the semantic level, so that meaning can only be contextually constructed, Foucault oriented his criticisms to the supposedly “emancipatory” power of universal reason by showing how forms of domination permeate micro-levels of power-control such as in sanatoriums, educational and religious bodies and so on. The control of life - known as bio-power - manifests itself in the attempt of “normalizing” and constraining individuals’ behaviors and psychic lives. For Foucault, reason is embedded into such practices which display in their turn the multiple layers of force. The activity of the analyst in this sense is not far from the same activity of the participant: there is no objective perspective which can be defended. Derrida, for instance, while pointing to the Habermasian idea of pragmatic communication, still avoids any overlapping by defending the thesis of a restless deconstructive potential of any constructing activity, so that no unavoidable pragmatic presuppositions nor idealizing conditions of communication can survive deconstruction. On the other hand, Habermasian “theory of communicative action and discourse ethics”, while remaining sensitive to contexts, defends transcendental conditions of discourse which, if violated, lead to performative contradiction. To the Habermasian role of “consensus” or “agreement” in discursive models, Foucault objected that rather than a “regulatory” principle, a true “critical” approach would simply command against “nonconsensuality” (see Rabinow, ed. 1984, p. 379 ff).

3. Concluding Thoughts

The debate between Foucault and Critical Theory – and in particular Habermas – is quite illuminating of the common “critical” purposes versus the diverging methodologies defended by the two approaches. For Foucault it is not correct to propose a second-order theory for defining what rationality is. Rationality is not to be found in abstract forms. On the contrary, what social criticism can achieve is the uncovering of deeply enmeshed forms of irrationality deposited in contingent and historical institution-embeddings. Genealogical method, though, does not reject that (ir)-rationality is part of history; on the contrary, rather than suggesting abstract and procedural rational models, it dissects concrete institutional social practices through “immanent criticism”. To this, Habermas has easily objected that any activity of rational criticism “presupposes” unavoidable conditions for its same exercise. This relaunches the necessity of formulating transcendental conditions for immanent criticism revealed along the same pragmatic conditions of criticism itself. For Habermas, criticism is possible only if universal standards of validity are recognized and only if understanding (Verständigung) and agreement (Einverständnis) are seen as interconnected practices.

A further line of criticism against Habermas, which embraces more widely Critical Theory as such, comes from scholars like Chantal Mouffe (2005) who have detected in the notion of “consensus” a surrender from engagement into “political agonism”. If, as Mouffe claims, the model of discursive action is bound to the achievement of consensus, then, what role would be reserved to politics after such an agreement has been obtained? The charge of eliminating the consideration of “political action” from “the political” has been extended, retrospectively, also to previous critical theorists such as Horkheimer, Adorno and Marcuse by the so-called third generation of critical theorists. The criticism concerns the non-availability of a context-specific political guidance answering the question “What is to be done?” (see Chambers 2004, p. 219 ff.) Whereas Critical Theory aims at fostering human emancipation, it remains incapable of specifying a political action-strategy for social change. A clear indication in this sense came, for instance, from Marcuse’s idea of “the Great Refusal”, which predicated abstention from full engagement and transformative attempts directed towards capitalist economy and democratic institutions (Marcuse 1964). It is indeed towards such a widespread trend that the third generation of critical theorists with Honneth, Fraser and Benhabib, among others, engaged in a philosophical dialogue integrating such lacunae. Honneth revisited the Hegelian notion of “(mis)-recognition” by enriching both its normative content, social significance and psychological force; Fraser insisted, instead, on the notion of “redistribution” as a key element for overcoming economic inequalities and power-imbalances in post-industrial societies where cultural affiliations are no more significant sources of power. Finally, Benhabib contributed to the clarification of the “universalist” trend by clarifying the significance of the Habermasian “dual-track” model, through the distinction between “moral” issues (universalism) proper of the institutional level and the “ethical” issues (pluralism) characterizing, instead, informal public deliberations. Benhabib’s views, by making explicit several Habermasian assumptions, seem to be able to countervail both the post-structuralist and the post-modern charge to Critical Theory’s absence of engagement into political action. Whereas the requirement of universalist “consensus” pertains only to the institutional sphere, the ethical domain is instead characterized by a plurality of views confronting each other within systems of life.

As introduced at the beginning, one can speak now of a “fourth” generation of Critical Theory scholars revolving mainly around the figure of Rainer Forst. Like that of his doctoral supervisor Jürgen Habermas, Forst’s philosophical preoccupation has been that of addressing the American political debate with the specific aim of constructing a third alternative paradigm to that of liberalism and communitarianism. Contrary to what might superficially appear at a first glance, Forst’s attempt has never been that of replacing “obsolete” Critical Theory arguments with contemporary analytic theories. On the contrary, he has often attempted at “integrating” and “bridging” analytic and continental traditions. These efforts are clearly visible also from one of Forst’s latest essays devoted to the normative justification of human rights (Forst, [2010] 2011). There the author refers to the “right to justification” as the grounding principle for the universal ascription of human rights. What is worth noticing is that the principle of the “right to justification” provokes echoes both across the analytic and the Critical Theory domain. It seems therefore that the new challenge Critical Theory is today facing consists precisely in detecting key concepts at the crossroads of both the Anglo-Saxon and the Continental tradition.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Adorno, Theodor W. et al. The Authoritarian Personality, New York: Harper and Brothers, 1950.
  • Adorno, Theodor W. Eine Bildmonographie, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 2003.
  • Adorno, Theodor W. “Freudian Theory and the Pattern of Fascist Propaganda” (1951), in Andrew Arato and Eike Gebhardt (eds.). The Essential Frankfurt School Reader, Continuum: New York, 1982.
  • Brunkhorst, Hauke. Solidarity: From Civic Friendship to a Global Legal Community, trans. by J. Flynn, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, (2002) 2005.
  • Chambers, Simone. “The Politics of Critical Theory”, in Fred Rush Fred (ed.). The Cambridge Companion to Critical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Couzens, David and Thomas McCarthy. Critical Theory. Oxford: Blackwell, 1994.
  • Forst, Rainer, “The Justification of Human Rights and the Basic Right to Justification. A Reflexive Approach”, Ethics 120:4 (2010), 711-40, reprinted in Claudio Corradetti (ed.). Philosophical Dimensions of Human Rights. Some Contemporary Views, Springer: Dordrecht, 2011.
  • Geuss, Raymond. The Idea of a Critical Theory. Habermas & the Frankfurt School, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. Knowledge and Human Interests. Boston: Beacon Press, (1968) 1971.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. “Questions and Counter-Questions”, Praxis International 4:3 (1984a).
  • Habermas, Jürgen. The Theory of Communicative Action, vols. 1 and 2, Boston: Beacon Press, (1981) 1984b.
  • Honneth, Axel. Critique of Power: Reflective Stages in a Critical Social Theory, trans. by Kenneth Baynes. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press,  [1985] 1991.
  • Honneth, Axel. The Struggle for Recognition: The Moral Grammar of Social Conflicts, trans. by Joel Anderson. Cambridge: Polity Press, [1986] 1995.
  • Honneth, Axel. “The Intellectual legacy of Critical Theory”, in Fred Rush (ed.). The Cambridge Companion to Critical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Horkheimer, Max. “Traditional and Critical Theory”, in Paul Connerton (ed.). Critical Sociology: Selected Readings, Harmondsworth: Penguin, [1937] 1976.
  • Horkheimer, Max and Theodor W. Adorno. Dialectic of Enlightenment, New York: Continuum, [1947] 1969.
  • Ingram, David. Critical Theory and Philosophy, St. Paul: Paragon House, 1990.
  • Ingram, David and Julia Simon-Ingram. Critical Theory: the Essential Readings, St. Paul: Paragon House, 1992.
  • Jay, Martin. The Dialectical Imagination, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1996.
  • Lukács, Georg. History and Class Consciousness, Cambridge Mass.: MIT Press, [1968], 1971.
  • Marcuse, Herbert. “Philosophie und Kritische Theorie”, Zeitschrift für Sozialforschung VI:3 (1937).
  • Marcuse, Herbert. One Dimensional Man: Studies in the Ideology of Advanced Industrial Society, Boston: Beacon Press, 1964.
  • Mouffe, Chantal. The Democratic Paradox, London: Verso, 2005.
  • Rabinow, Paul (ed.). “Politics and Ethics: an Interview”, in The Foucault Reader, New York: Pantheon, 1984.
  • Rush, Fred. Critical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Wiggershaus, Rolf. The Frankfurt School, Cambridge: Polity Press, 1995.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, London: Routledge, 2001 [1st English edition 1922].

Author Information

Claudio Corradetti
Email: crrcld00@uniroma2.it
European Academy and the University of Rome
Italy

Occasionalism

Occasionalism

In the minds of most philosophers with a passing familiarity with early-modern philosophy, occasionalism is typically regarded as a laughable ad hoc or ‘for want of anything better’ solution to the mind-body problem, first opened up in Descartes’ Meditations. As typically presented in philosophy textbooks, the doctrine (usually identified exclusively with Nicholas Malebranche) certainly seems laughable: beginning from the assumption that the actual transmission of anything between body and mind is impossible, occasionalism holds that, for example, when my finger is pricked by a needle, no physical effect—neither the puncture of the needle nor the activity of my nerves—reaches my mind, but rather God directly produces the sensation of the prick within my mind on the occasion of the needle’s contact with my finger. Similarly, when I will to retract my finger away from the needle, my incorporeal will is utterly impotent to produce any such corporeal movement, so God again intercedes and directly produces the movement of the finger on the occasion of my willing.

Such supposedly was the doctrine of occasionalism, which, when presented in such a manner, occasions little more than an eye-roll from modern readers. Yet, this “textbook view” of occasionalism (much like the contemporary fixation on Descartes’ Meditations over his Principles of Philosophy) has everything to do with the interests, problems, and concerns of philosophy in the late and post-modern periods, and almost nothing to do with the actual doctrine of occasionalism in its own historical context. Indeed, occasionalism is not peculiar to early-modern philosophy or Cartesianism at all, but was an influential school in both Latin and Islamic medieval philosophy extending back to the tenth century. Moreover, for a strange and systematically theological system of metaphysics, occasionalism is the progenitor of a number of remarkable developments in Western philosophy, some of which laid the foundation for the development of modern science itself.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Motivations for Occasionalism
    1. Islamic and Latin Medieval Occasionalism
    2. Cartesian Occasionalism
  3. Primary Arguments for Occasionalism
    1. Causation is Not a Phenomenon
    2. No Forces or Powers
    3. No Necessary Connection
    4. Continual Creation
  4. The Place of Occasionalism in the History of Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources in English
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

In spite of its historical deficiencies, the aforementioned “textbook view” of occasionalism was not entirely off the mark. The Cartesian occasionalists generally—but not exclusively—made appeal to the doctrine as a solution to the problem of mind-body interaction. Moreover, this interpretation actually has its origins in the period itself. Both G. W. Leibniz and Bernard le Bovier de Fontenelle notably described occasionalism as primarily a reaction to Descartes’ failure to explain the mind-body union (See Leibniz, “to Arnauld, 9 Oct. 1687,” Philosophical Papers, 522; Fontenelle, Doutes, 1:529-30). Nonetheless, Leibniz and Fontenelle were mistaken in their interpretations. As the first true Cartesian occasionalist, Louis de La Forge, argues:

I think most people would not believe me if I said that it is no more difficult to conceive how the human mind, without being extended, can move the body and how the body without being a spiritual thing can act on the mind, and to conceive how a body has the power to move itself and to communicate motion to another body. Yet there is nothing more true. (Traité, 143)

While the commitments of individual philosophers varied, in its pure form, occasionalism was a global denial of causality outside the direct and immediate volitional activity of God—both between bodies and between minds and bodies.

This is important to note as it forms the locus of the distinction between three classic metaphysical models of the causal relationship between God and his Creation: occasionalism, concurrentism, conservationism. Conservationism can best be described as the common view among the lay followers of the Abrahamic faith, as Malebranche himself notes (Recherche, 677). It holds that God created the world in the beginning, but that since that moment and with the exception of miracles, the world runs causally of its own accord and on the basis of its own powers and principles, without the need for God to be continually and perpetually involved. In spite of its mass appeal, conservationism was almost never taken seriously by Christian or Islamic theologians and was denounced as heretical for a variety of reasons that need not concern us here, for the much more important historical distinction was between concurrentism and occasionalism. Owing it origins to Augustine, concurrentism became the causal metaphysic of St. Thomas Aquinas and his legion followers. It holds that both God and finite created causes contribute to the production of particular effects, namely that God “concurs” or assents to the natural activity of the cause and thereby contributes his potency to the production of its effects, without which such a cause would be impotent and incapable of producing its customary effect. Occasionalism, by contrast, holds that finite creatures are utterly impotent by themselves, contribute nothing metaphysically to the production of any effects to which they may be associated, but instead serve only as merely nominal indicators or occasions for the one sole cause in the universe: God. Thus, while Aquinas’ account of the regular operations of nature is grounded in a grand system of agent causes and their patients, for the occasionalist, the regular operations of nature are governed by a system of occasional causes that cohere only on the basis of the regularity of God’s will concerning them.

This raises the question: What exactly is an occasional cause? One example would be a placebo, a designation that could be applied to almost anything, but is understood as such insofar as it serves as the cause of the “placebo effect.” Yet, as has been noted in clinical analyses of the placebo effect, this causal conception is clearly mistaken insofar as a placebo is typically an inert compound or pointless “therapy” that does not actually cause anything in particular, much less its salutary effect. Nonetheless, without the presence and administration of the placebo, the effect would not follow, or not follow as often as it does, and thus a placebo may be understood as an indispensable cause that serves as the occasion for whatever psycho-physical causality that takes place in the body which produces the placebo effect.

So then, what does an occasionalist metaphysic and account of causality look like? Well, to begin with the classic example of mind-body interaction described in the summary: when I look out the window of my office, there is no real causal connection between the clouds and sky as physical objects and the representative idea I have of them in my mind; rather, God immediately and directly produces such a correspondent image in my mind upon the occasion of me turning my head and looking out the window at them. Similarly, there is no real causal connection between the activity of my will to turn my head to the right and look out my window and the physical action of my head turning; for my head moves on the basis of the physical contraction of opposing muscle groups in my neck, which pull on and rotate my cervical vertebrae, thereby effecting the turn. Moreover, for reasons that will be seen, there is no real causal connection between the contraction of these muscles and the movement of my head; rather, God immediately and directly produces the movement of my head on the occasion of the contraction of the muscles in my neck, which are similarly produced by him on the occasion of my will to turn my head to the right.

This elaborate metaphysical and theological description of such a simple action raises the question: Why would any philosopher advance such a bizarre and counter-intuitive theory to explain such basic phenomena?

2. Motivations for Occasionalism

Given the customary prejudice of philosophers towards occasionalism (supposing they’ve heard of it at all), it is necessary to consider the motivation(s) underlying such a strange doctrine, which nonetheless attracted many of the greatest minds of medieval and early-modern philosophy.

The main figures behind the development of occasionalist thought in the Middle Ages were, as might be expected, concerned predominantly with theological issues. Numerous passages in the Old and New Testament are ambiguously suggestive of an occasionalist reading, such as Job 38:12-41, 1 Corinthians 12:6, and Isaiah 26:12. To quote one passage, cited by Malebranche in favor of occasionalism: “This is what the Lord, your protector, says, the one who formed you in the womb: ‘I am the Lord, who made everything, who alone stretched out the sky, who fashioned the earth all by myself’” (Isaiah 44:22). The important part of this quote is not the claim of God (even the conservationists accepted that God acted alone in the moment of creation), but rather Isaiah’s claim that, as Malebranche puts it, “only God acts and forms children in their mother’s womb” (Recherche, 677).

However, such Scriptural testimony was far too ambiguous to inspire or justify occasionalism on its own terms. Rather, occasionalism was born of a dispute centered on the deeply problematic relationship between Greek rationalist philosophy and the dogmas of the Abrahamic religions that seemed incommensurable with this tradition, namely the doctrine of creation ex nihilo and the possibility of miracles. There was a pervasive tendency in later antiquity among those educated in Greek philosophy to be embarrassed by the “abominations of reason,” latent in their religious creeds, which impelled them to attempt a synthesis. These attempts to harmonize Abrahamic monotheism with the philosophy of the pagans invariably provoked a reaction from their less philosophically inclined co-religionists who sought to uphold the dogmas of the Faith without intellectual rationalizations or prevarications. These reactions divide into two almost diametrically opposed camps corresponding to the two great bursts of occasionalist thought in the history of philosophy.

a. Islamic and Latin Medieval Occasionalism

In the Islamic tradition, the thought of the Arab polymath and father of Islamic philosophy, al-Kindi (801-873), marks the tentative beginning of a syncretism of Islam and Greek philosophy. This syncretism was further developed in the 9th and 10th centuries by a school of philosophers known as the Mu’tazalites, the premiere representatives of whom were al-Farabi (c. 872-950) and Avicenna (c. 980-1037). The metaphysical system of the Mu’tazalites was a hybrid of Aristotelianism and Neoplatonism typical of late-antiquity. Though al-Farabi and Avicenna remained nominal Muslims, their rationalist philosophical beliefs stood at considerable odds with the depiction of God and his relation to the world in the Qur’an: most notably, their critics accused them of denying the Abrahamic doctrine of creation ex nihilo and being incapable, on account of their necessitarian conception of causality, to explain the existence or possibility of miracles.

This latter issue over miracles in particular attracted the ire of certain Islamic theologians who were followers of a fundamentalist school begun in the early 10th century by al-Ash’ari (874-936), the most illustrious member of whom was al-Ghazali (1058-1111). The Mutazalites held, in customary rationalist manner, that causes are logically sufficient for the production of their effects and thus entail their existence in an essentially logical and syllogistic manner. While any particular cause (for example fire) may not be in-itself sufficient for the production of its effect (namely burning), given the presence of certain necessary conditions (for example air, and combustible substrate), the effect would follow necessarily from the presence and existence of the cause. That is to say, for fire and a combustible material to be brought together in the presence of oxygen, yet fail to produce burning, was regarded as a logical impossibility tantamount to a formal contradiction.

The objection of the Ash’irites to this principle is not difficult to understand: a natural order that operates on the basis of causes that logically necessitate their effects cannot be reconciled with the existence of miracles, which, as attested to in Holy Scripture, often depend on such an “impossible” disjunction between cause and effect. For example, there is the famous example of the “Burning Bush” from Exodus 3:1-21, which describes a combustible material that is on fire, but was not consumed by the flames. Another example is a story from the Book of Daniel of the three youths (Abednego, Meshach, and Shadrach) who were thrown into Nebuchadnezzar’s “Fiery Furnace,” yet miraculously escaped burning due to interference by an angel of God. Miracles such as these were interpreted literally by Ash’irite theologians and regarded as involving the presence of a natural cause but the absence of its customary effect due to a supernatural intervention by God.

This disjunction of causes and effects in instances of miracles was not itself problematic as long as Jews, Christians, and Muslims believed that God could do the impossible. Yet, such an interpretation of the divine omnipotence was strongly resisted by almost every important theologian of the Abrahamic religions and the orthodox conception of the limits of God’s power was identified as coextensive with the logically possible. To quote the Islamic theologian, al-Ghazali: “No one has power over the Impossible. What the Impossible means is the affirmation of something together with its denial…that which is not impossible is within [God’s] power” (Tahafut, 194). This is a very important point for it requires that, if miracles such as the above did indeed happen, they must have been—pace the assertion of ancient philosophers—logically possible on their own terms. Thus, the concession that God cannot do the impossible puts the onus on the believer in miracles to explain how such causal syncopations are possible. That is to say, it requires the believer to do philosophy—critical analytic philosophy—and thereby defeat the ancient philosophers at their own game.

This Islamic dispute was transferred essentially wholesale to the West through Averroës and Maimonidies in the 12th century and formed the basis of the nominalist reaction against Thomistic scholasticism, which they regarded as being similarly necessitarian and incompatible with the divine omnipotence.

b. Cartesian Occasionalism

By the time of Descartes, the nature of the occasionalist impulse had changed dramatically. Nowhere among the Cartesian occasionalists does one encounter the deep concern over the divine omnipotence or for reconciling philosophy with the testimony of Scripture typical of the Medievals. Even Malebranche, who—alone among his cohort—offered a few (weak) theological arguments in favor of occasionalism, never seemed bothered by the particular theological concerns of his medieval predecessors, even though—again, alone among his cohort—he demonstrated familiarity with them (See LO, 680). Instead, Cartesian occasionalism was a tendency and development organic to Cartesianism itself, which the successors of Descartes were driven to pursue exclusively under the pressure of severe problems in the Cartesian systems of physics and metaphysics and not from any particular religious motivation. These pressures included:

The Mind-Body Problem

This problem, while hardly unique to Descartes, was nonetheless forced by his substance dualism into a more radical and metaphysical framework than had been the case otherwise. Now, as noted in the introduction, the classic textbook view of occasionalism as an ad hoc solution to Descartes’ mind-body problem is almost entirely without warrant. Nonetheless, the mind-body problem was a particular area of concern for Descartes’ successors and occasionalism provided such a convenient solution that this “textbook” view took hold with considerable facility. Nonetheless, Steven Nadler argues that the mind-body problem was not a “specific” problem engendering Cartesian occasionalism and moreover “was not even recognized as a special case of some more general causal problem” (Nadler, 1997, 76). For the Cartesians, the nature of efficient causality was a metaphysical problem in itself.

The Rejection of Scholastic Forms and Causal Powers

Descartes describes the substantial forms of the Scholastics as having been “introduced by philosophers solely to account for the proper actions of natural things, of which they were supposed to be the principles and bases” (CSMK III, 208). Yet, Descartes is adamant that “no natural action at all can be explained by these substantial forms,” insofar as they “account” for the “proper actions of natural things” by metaphysical reification rather than epistemological explanation. They are thus “occult” and inscrutable (CSMK III, 208-9), and moreover otiose and redundant as explanations of phenomena, which, as Descartes is adamant, may be entirely accounted for in terms of local movements (CSM I, 83).

This mechanistic account of causal interaction allowed for a novel argument against the possibility of corporeal efficacy, which follows from Descartes’ rejection of substantial forms combined with his insistence that the qualities of body are exhausted by their mere geometric extension and whatever minimal features may be directly derived from as much. The point is, nowhere contained in the purely quantitative idea of extension is any notion of qualitative powers, forms, disposition, potentialities, and the like, from which it may be concluded that matter was essentially passive and inert.

Cartesian Nominalism

Unlike the Scholastics who regarded motion to be an accident, the Cartesians regarded motion to be a mode of body—thereby denying the Scholastic presumption of a metaphysically real distinction between a thing and its qualities, and instead insisting that there was no ontological difference between the “modes of being [façons d’ être]” of a thing and the thing itself (Lennon, 1974, 34). Given this, it would be as impossible to conceive a body transferring its motion to another body as it would be possible to conceive a body transferring its shape or divisibility to another body.

Continual Creation

Lastly, there is Descartes’ acceptance and advancement of the doctrine that God preserves the world via continual creation (See CSM II, 33; CSM I, 200). This was a customary supposition of occasionalism since al-Ghazali and the Ash’irite occasionalists. While Descartes’ commitment to this doctrine is insufficiently distinct from what might be maintained by a Thomistic concurrentist to qualify incontrovertibly as occasionalism, his successors would interpret the matter more forcefully and in a manner that rendered the concurrence of secondary causes otiose.

3. Primary Arguments for Occasionalism

Throughout the seven centuries of its history, occasionalist philosophy has been advanced and defended through a plethora of different arguments. Remarkably, there does not seem to be any particular “master argument” that appears across all the figures in this tradition. Certain arguments are more common or carried greater cache than others, but occasionalism was never an axiomatic system of metaphysics, and thus the principles and arguments behind it are more of a liquid coacervate than a structured edifice. Some of the strongest and most common arguments made against the efficacy of secondary causes and in favor of the system of occasional causes shall be examined here.

a. Causation is Not a Phenomenon

In observing a particular causal interaction, one does not see the actual causality underlying the interaction, but only a succession of events. This claim is most commonly identified with Hume, but it is actually of considerable antiquity and has often stood as the opening gambit of occasionalism since its very beginning. It was first advanced by al-Baqillani in the 10th century and reiterated by al-Ghazali, who argues:

Fire, which is an inanimate thing, has no action. How can one prove that it is an agent? The only argument is from the observation of the fact of burning at the time of contact with fire. But observation only shows that one is with the other, not that it is by it and has no other cause than it. (Tahafut, 186)

Virtually every philosopher associated with occasionalism would repeat this argument in some form or another. Even after the disappearance of medieval occasionalism in the 15th and 16th centuries, the argument would resurface among the earliest of the Cartesian occasionalists, Louis de La Forge (1632-1666) and Géraud de Cordemoy (1624-1684). La Forge notes:

I will be told, is it not clear and evident that heavy things move downwards, that light things rise upwards, and that bodies communicate their motion to one another? I agree, but there is a big difference between the obviousness of the effect and that of the cause. The effect is very clear here, for what do our senses show use more clearly than the various movements of bodies? But do they show us the force which carries heavy things downwards, light things upwards, and how one body has the power to make another body move? (Traité, 143; emphasis added)

Cordemoy concurs and reformulates the argument in more classically Cartesian terms, namely concerning colliding bodies:

When we say, for example, that body B drives body C away from its place, if we examine well what is acknowledged for certain in this case, we will only see that body B was moved, that it encountered C, which was at rest, and that since this encounter, the first ceased to be moved [and] the second commenced to be. (Discernement, 137; trans. Albondi, 59)

This is the formula of which Hume is typically given credit.

b. No Forces or Powers

The rejection of ‘forces’ or ‘powers’ internal to a particular piece of matter follows empirically from the above denial that we can actually see causation, as well as rationally from the argument, made in antiquity by Sextus Empiricus: “since…so much divergency is shown to exist in objects, we shall not be able to state what character belongs to the object in respect of its real essence, but only what belongs to it in respect of this particular rule of conduct, or law, or habit, and so on” (Outlines of Pyrrhonism, I. XIV, 163). Avicenna attempted to respond to this point by developing a claim made by Aristotle (See Physics 196b) that postulates an inductive “hidden syllogism” [qiyas khafiyy] tacit within causal judgments that allows for the inference of causal powers:

A tested experience is exemplified by our judgment that scammony purges bile. For when this [observed association] is repeated many times, it no longer belongs to the category of what occurs coincidentally. The mind then judges that it is of the nature of scammony to purge bile, and it acquiesces in it. Thus, purging bile is a necessary accident of scammony…and [scammony] necessitates it [the effect of purging bile] by some proximate power within it, or property in it, or a relation connected with it. It becomes correct [to conclude] through this kind of demonstration that there is a cause in scammony by nature and associated with it, which purges bile. (al-Burhan, 95; trans. Kogan, 87-88)

Avicenna’s ambiguity regarding the correct conclusion of this “demonstration” and the source of necessity between scammony and its purgative power is revealing, particularly in his indecisive conflation of “a cause in scammony by nature” with one merely “associated with it.”

Al-Ghazali seizes on this ambiguity and declares that Avicenna’s “kind of demonstration” underlying causal judgments is not a demonstration at all for it lacks any entailment: “existence with a thing does not prove being by it” (Tahafut, 186). To prove this point, al-Ghazali provides an example:

Suppose there is a blind man whose eyes are diseased, and who has not heard from anyone of the difference between night and day. If one day his disease is cured, and he can consequently see colours, he will guess that the agent of the perception of the forms of colours which has now been acquired by his eyes is the opening of the eyes. (Tahafut, 186)

This particular argument is essentially identical to Hume’s famous example in the Enquiry concerning the causal expectations of Adam when encountering fire and water for the first time (See Enquiry, VI.2, 27).

The Cartesians regarded suppositions of ‘force’ or ‘power’ inhering in bodies as occult properties incapable of being clearly and distinctly understood. Following Descartes, they regarded material bodies as effectively hypostatizations of Euclidian geometry, the qualities of which are exhausted by their mere geometric extension and whatever minimal features may be directly derived from as much. The point is, for the Cartesians, we have a clear and distinct idea of the essence of body as res extensa. Nowhere contained in this purely quantitative idea is any notion of qualitative powers, forms, disposition, potentialities, and the like. As Malebranche asks the reader:

Consult the idea of extension and judge by that idea, which represents bodies if anything does, whether they can have some property other than the passive faculty of receiving various shapes and various motions. Is it not evident to the last degree that properties of extension can consist only in relations of distance? (Dialouges, VII.2 147)

From this minimalist and quantitative conception of matter, the Cartesians concluded that matter was existentially passive and inert and derided the Scholastic-Aristotelian epistemology of causal explanation as fundamentally animistic—a point that seems evident in Aquinas’ claim:

[Real relations exist in] those things which by their own very nature are ordered to each other, and have a mutual inclination…as in a heavy body is found an inclination and order to the centre; and hence there exists in the heavy body a certain respect in regard to the centre and the same applies to other things. (Summa theologica, 1, q. 28, a. 1)

This physics based on internal “inclinations” Descartes categorically rejected, noting that his youthful conception of gravity was based on a (typically Scholastic) equivocation between notions of mind and notions of body:

[W]hat makes it especially clear that my idea of gravity was taken largely from the idea I have of the mind is the fact that I thought that gravity carried bodies towards the centre of the earth as if it had some knowledge of the centre within itself. For this surely could not happen without knowledge, and there can be no knowledge except in a mind. (CSM II, 298. See also: “Letter to Mersenne,” CSMK III 216 and “Letter to Arnauld,” CSMK III 358.)

Descartes’ argument here became a major argument in favor of occasionalism among his successors, particularly by Malebranche, whose mouthpiece in the Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion instructs:

Contemplate the archetype of bodies, intelligible extension. This represents them since it is in accordance with it that they all have been made. This idea is entirely luminous…Do you not see clearly that bodies can be moved but they cannot move themselves? You hesitate. Well then, let us suppose that this chair can move itself: Which way will it go? With what velocity? At what time will it take it into its head to move? You would have to give the chair an intellect and a will capable of determining itself…Otherwise, a power of moving itself would be of no use at all to it. (Dialogues, VII, 151; emphasis added)

Malebranche’s claim here is essentially: to ascribe active powers to something that is defined only in terms of geometric extension is like ascribing ‘jealousy’ to a cardboard box. This conclusion is in line with the standard Cartesian accusation against Aristotelianism, namely that, even when stripped of any supposition of final causality, Aristotelian causal explanation inherently projects what are effectively intentional states onto otherwise inanimate objects.

Moreover, the particular argument Malebranche employs to make his point—while novel amongst the Cartesians—is very old indeed. Parmenides famously argued against the possibility of creation by asking: “…what creation wilt thou seek for [what is]? How and whence did it grow? I [shall not] allow thee to say or to think, ‘from that which is not’; for…what need would have driven it on to grow, starting from nothing, at a later time rather than an earlier?” (Simplicus, Commentary on the Physics, 145; Kirk & Raven 347) To this al-Ghazali responded that only inanimate creatures not possessed of a will are strictly subject to the principle of sufficient reason, such “that fire is so created that when it finds two pieces of cotton which are similar, it will burn both of them, as it cannot discriminate between two similar things” (Tahafut, 190). Given their enslavement to the principle of sufficient reason, creatures lacking a will are incapable of self-initiated movement for it would be impossible for them to decide to move in one direction rather than another, or do so at one moment rather than another, given that all points in space and time are qualitatively identical, and thus—in terms of the order of possible reasons—indifferent. Thus al-Ghazali concludes that all change must be initiated by a will with metaphysical capacity to choose and act arbitrarily, thereby distinguishing and picking between identicals differing only by number (Tahafut, 24-7).

This voluntarist reasoning Malebranche weaves into the Cartesian rubric, concluding:

It is clear that no body, large or small, has the power to move itself…We have only two sorts of ideas, ideas of minds and ideas of bodies; and as we should speak only of what we conceive, we should only reason according to these two kinds of ideas. Thus, since the idea we have of all bodies makes us aware that they cannot move themselves, it must be concluded that it is minds which move them. (Recherche, 448)

Yet Malebranche flatly denies that finite human minds have any such capacity to generate movement, insisting that we “have no clear idea of this power soul has over the body” (Ibid., 670). He justifies this claim first on empirical grounds, arguing that, were one to claim:

I know through the inner sensation of my action that I truly have this power…I [would] reply that when they move their arm they have an inner sensation of the actual volition by which they move it; and they are not mistaken in believing that they have this volition…I grant that they have an inner sensation that the arm is moved during the effort; and on this assumption I also agree…that the movement of the arm occurs at the instant we feel this effort…But I deny that this effort, which is only a modification or sensation of the soul…is by itself able to impart motion to the animal spirits, or to determine them. (Ibid.)

c. No Necessary Connection

The argument that cause and effect share no necessary connection between them began with al-Ghazali’s coruscating insight that “the connection between what are believed to be the cause and the effect is not necessary. Take any two things. This is not That; nor can That be This” (Tahafut, 185). This point has both an epistemological and a logico-ontological prongs. The former hinges on what Hume called the “establish’d maxim”: Supposing we have a complete understanding of the quiddities of, say, fire and cotton, al-Ghazali asks: “how can we conceive that one of them should burn, and the other should not? There is no alternative for the other piece” (Tahafut, 188). That is to say, the very fact that cause and effect are epistemologically distinct means that we can always consider the one without the other; and subject to that mere possibility, no logically necessary relation can exist between the two.

The deeper logico-existential prong of al-Ghazali’s “This is not That” insight, which Hume never truly grasped, hinges on the very nature of identity and logical connection itself. A door had been conveniently opened by Avicenna, who insisted that the hallmark of efficient causes is their ontological distinctness from their effects (Metaphysics, 173). Al-Ghazali follows Avicenna on this point, but then poses the question: what does this ontological distinctness entail? A necessary connection requires that one event is logically bound to another, such that the cause is sufficient (given the fulfillment of certain necessary conditions) to bring about the effect. Yet how is this logical connection possible? “This is not That” precisely because two distinct things, as distinct things, cannot be bound of themselves by any necessary connection: “The affirmation of one does not imply the affirmation of the other; nor does its denial imply the denial of the other. The existence of the one is not necessitated by the existence of the other; nor its non-existence by the non-existence of the other” (Tahafut, 185). For example, it is impossible to conceive of a dog while not also conceiving of an animal precisely because there is a necessary relationship between the two — the antecedent entails the consequent as a modus ponens. This is the type of standard that relations of necessity demand. Yet, the relationship between the concept ‘dog’ and the concept ‘animal’ is not causal but rather definitional, the predicate being contained in the subject. Causation, on the other hand, is not a definitional relationship, but rather one that takes place between two otherwise discrete things, and thus cannot include under it any notion of necessity. The occasionalist conclusion he draws from this is that, if two distinct events are to be necessarily conjoined, they can only be so “as the result of the Decree of God, which preceded their existence. If one follows the other, it is because He has created them in that fashion, not because the connection in itself is necessary and indissoluble” (Tahafut, 185; emphasis added).

This principle of al-Ghazali’s, namely that the logical non-identity of cause and effect logically precludes any necessary connection between them, was rigorously and systematically developed by the fourteenth century nominalists William of Ockham and Nicholaus of Autrecourt, forming the touchstone of their skeptical attacks on the Peripatetic scholasticism that had taken over Western philosophy and theology following the work of William of Auvergne and Aquinas in the previous century. It was the Aristotelian conception of ontology as an active, pluralistic, and substantial structure composed of both things as well as real principles internal to them—principles that define the natural order in a deep, interwoven, and rational way, so as to provide philosophy direct access to this order as well as the possibility of offering a systematic and all-encompassing explanation of its operations—that was the primary object of the nominalists’ ire. By contrast, the nominalists regarded the Real as composed of discrete individual singulars.

Ockham paved new ground in the epistemology of causal explanation due to his almost obsessive concern over the divine omnipotence and the possibility of divine interference in any particular instance of cause and effect. If, as Ockham and the “theologians” declared: “Whatever God can produce by means of secondary causes, He can directly produce and preserve without them” (OTh 9: 604.17-20; Philosophical Writings, 25), then it follows that God can create an effect without any antecedent cause and, more importantly, an antecedent ‘cause’ without any consequent effect. Thus the standard of necessary connection, by which the effect must follow from its cause, collapses, and thus inference from one to the other lacks demonstrative warrant:

Between a cause and its effect is a particularly essential order and dependence; nevertheless, the simple knowledge of some one thing does not entail the simple knowledge of some other thing. This is also something that everyone experiences within himself; however perfectly he may know a particular thing, he will never be able to know, with simple and proper knowledge, another thing which he has never previously experienced, either by sensation or intellect. (OTh 1: 241.15-21; translation is the author’s)

Moreover, it is impossible to know, logically or empirically, if God produces any particular effect directly or through secondary causes. That is to say, using occasionalist terminology, if b can be produced by God directly without a, we can never know in any given instance of a followed by b if a actually caused b, if a was merely the occasion for b, or if the two are even connected at all:

[I]t cannot be demonstrated that any effect is produced by a secondary cause, because even though fire always follows when fire is brought close to combustible material, it is possible that the fire is not the cause. For God could have ordained that he alone caused combustion whenever fire is present to a patient close by, just as he has ordained with the Church that when certain words are spoken grace is caused in the soul. (OTh 5:72.21)

Given such an epistemological gap, the positive metaphysical concept of causation collapses and all we are left with is a phenomenal account resting on repeated observation and the continuity of nature.

Ockham had defined an efficient cause in his Summula philosophiae naturalis as “that at whose real existence something has a new different being completely distinct from that cause” (OPh 6: 218.26). Yet, he failed to appreciate the full logical force of this definition. This was left to his successor, Nicholaus of Autrecourt. Autrecourt was adamant that it is impossible to reason from the existence of causal activity of one thing to the existence or effect receptivity of another thing, for: “‘From the fact that some thing is known to be, it cannot be inferred evidently, by evidentness reduced to the first principle, or to the certitude of the first principle, that there is some other thing’…[for] ‘In such an inference…the consequent would not be factually identical with the antecedent’” (Letter to Bernard, §11). Given such a factual non-identity, “the opposite of the consequent would be compatible with whatever is signified by the antecedent, without contradiction” (Letter to Bernard, §15). Autrecourt applies this logical principle directly to the issue of causal explanation, arguing against Duns Scotus that repeated and infallible experience of a conjunction between two things is not demonstrative of the fact that one is the effect of the other:

[O]nly conjecturative habit [habitus conjecturativus], not certainty, is had concerning things known by experience, in the way in which it is said that rhubarb cures cholera, or that a magnet attracts iron. When it is proven [namely by Scotus] that certitude [comes] from the proposition existing in the mind which states that what is usually produced by a non-free cause is its natural effect, I ask what you call a natural cause. A cause which has produced what has happened usually, and which will still produce in the future if [the cause] lasts and is applied? Then the minor premise is not known. Even if something has been produced usually, it is still not certain whether it must be produced in the future. (Exigit, 237)

While neither Ockham nor Autrecourt pursued their causal skepticism into occasionalism, Autrecourt notably acknowledges occasionalism as a possibility. Among the claims that he was forced to retract by the Papal Curia in Avignon were the assertions that “we do not evidently know that anything other than God can be the cause of some effect,” and “we do not evidently know that any cause which is not God to act as an efficient cause” (Quattor atriculi confessati, §§15-18).

Among the Cartesian occasionalists, Malebranche was the only one to employ the ‘no necessary connection’ argument in favor of occasionalism, which Leibniz deemed his “strongest argument for why God alone acts” (Malebranche et Leibniz, 412; trans. by Sleigh, 171). Malebranche avers: “A true cause as I understand it is one such that the mind perceives a necessary connection [liaison nécessaire] between it and its effect” (Recherche, 450). On this basis he concludes:

It is clear that no body, large or small, has the power to move itself…Thus, since the idea we have of all bodies makes us aware that they cannot move themselves, it must be concluded that it is minds which move them. But when we examine our idea of all finite minds, we do not see any necessary connection between their will and the motion of any body whatsoever. On the contrary, we see that there is none and that there can be none.” (Ibid., 670; emphasis added)

Give the utter impotence of bodies vis-à-vis motion, it is obvious by elimination that, if they are moved, they must get such movement from a mind. Yet, by the same reasoning, Malebranche has also shown that this movement cannot come from any finite human mind, for the dictates of such minds are not necessarily connected with their intended effects. There is only one mind that has the power to forge a necessary connection between that which it wills and the effect the will produces:

But when one thinks about the idea of God, i.e., of an infinitely perfect and consequently all-powerful being, one know there is such a connection between His will and the motion of all bodies, that it is impossible to conceive that He wills a body to be moved and that this body not be moved. We must therefore say that only His will can move bodies if we wish to state things as we conceive them and not as we sense them. (Ibid., 448)

d. Continual Creation

Continual creation is a metaphysico-theological doctrine concerning God’s relation to the Creation which maintains that the ontological permanence of the Creation is derived not from itself, but rather through God’s continual volitional preservation of it via the same power from which he created it ex nihilo in the beginning.

Biblical support for the doctrine of continual creation stemmed primarily from John 5:17 and Acts 17:28. Regarding the former, Jesus was persecuted by the Jews for performing works on the Sabbath, to which he responded: “My Father is always working, and so am I.” This passage was cited by Augustine in support of his argument that the biblical claim that God “rests” on the seventh day of creation should not be taken to mean a complete inactivity vis-à-vis the creation, but only rests “in the sense of not creating any new creature” (De genesi ad lit., 4.12). Thus Augustine concludes that:

[E]ven on the seventh day His power ceased not from ruling heaven and earth and all that He had made, for otherwise they would have perished immediately. For the power and might of the Creator, who rules and embraces all, makes every creature abide; and if this power ever ceased to govern creatures, their essences would pass away and all nature would perish. When a builder puts up a house and departs, his work remains in spite of the fact that he is no longer there. But the universe will pass away in the twinkling of an eye if God withdraws His ruling hand. (Summa contra gentiles, 3.65)

Augustine’s understanding of the metaphysics of divine preservation here is obviously nascent, but he is clear on one matter: God need not act in order for the Creation to be extinguished into non-being, but rather merely cease his continual “work.”

This principle became the foundation of the ‘preservation is but continual creation’ doctrine held by both the Thomistic concurrentists and Islamic occasionalists. In the case of the former, Aquinas approvingly quotes Augustine in defense of the doctrine and reiterates the claim that: “Were God to annihilate, it would not be through some action, but through cessation from action” (Summa theologiae, 1a. 104, 3). On this point Aquinas and the Islamic occasionalists were in full agreement; their main disagreement lay in whether or not God’s “work” in preserving the world was metaphysically continuous or discrete. Aquinas followed the Neoplatonic emanationist tradition in siding with the former conception, while the Islamic occasionalists argued for the latter. As Aquinas himself describes their reasoning: “in order to be able to maintain that the world needs to be preserved by God,” they held “that all forms are accidents, and that no accident lasts for two instants, so that things would always be in the process of formation” (Summa contra gentiles, 3.65). The reason for the divergence is that, while both were in agreement as to the metaphysics of annihilation and maintained that “existence is not the nature or essence of any created thing” (Ibid.), the Islamic occasionalists took this principle (along with the identification of divine preservation with creation ex nihilo) to a much more radical conclusion, arguing that finite creatures are inherently driven to non-being by themselves. (Guide, 109a). God’s will is simple and singular: He wills to create a world of things; these things do not have existence as part of their essence; therefore, they immediately vanish into non-being the moment after their creation, upon which God preserves them by recreating them again from the very nothing into which they had vanished (Ibid.).

The upshot of this metaphysic is a static punctiform ontology in which the very notions of “substance” or “natures,” upon which Aristotelian physics and metaphysics is based, collapse. Finite creatures are rendered fragmented shadows of being whose particular features are utterly contingent and the product of mere temporal congruence rather than from any substance ontology. As Maimonides explains, from this doctrine, the Islamic occasionalists denied that “there is a nature in any respect whatever and that the nature of one particular body may require that this and that accident be attached to that body. Quite the contrary, they wish to say that God…created the accidents in question now, without the intermediary of nature—without any other thing” (Guide, 109b). Under such a cinematographic ontology, then, the notion that particular finite creatures could cause effects in other finite creatures is unintelligible, for the world exists as a seriatim of static time slices, each of which are intersticed by vacua of non-being, and thus the states of affairs in any one instant/iteration is not only logically distinct from its successor, but ontologically so as well.

The doctrine of continual creation was inducted into the Cartesian tradition by Descartes himself, who famously notes in the Meditations:

[A] lifespan can be divided into countless parts, each completely independent of the others, so that it does not follow from the fact that I existed a little while ago that I must exist now, unless there is some cause which as it were creates me afresh at this moment—that is, which preserves me. For it is quite clear to anyone who attentively considers the nature of time that the same power and action are needed to preserve anything at each individual moment or its duration as would be required to create that thing anew if it were not yet in existence. (CSM II, 33)

Descartes’ argument concerning time is designed to occlude Hobbes’ and Gassendi’s conservationist mechanism—as well as the belief of the common person—whereby God creates the universe in the beginning, animates it with motion, then steps back from the machine, which continues to exist and operate of its own accord (See CSM II, 254). Yet Descartes’ conception of continual creation seems to be quite different from that of the Islamic occasionalists. First, as Kenneth Clatterbaugh points out, “Descartes only states that the continued existence of substances requires God’s continuous creation; he says nothing about the need to re-create all its states” (Clatterbaugh, 39). Moreover, nowhere does Descartes argue that a body’s causal capacities are dependent upon such recreation, nor does he advance the Ash’irite claim that the nature of such recreation is metaphysically discrete insofar as creatures lapse back into non-being immediately after the moment of their creation.

Regardless, many of Descartes’ successors saw a radicalization of this doctrine as a perfect justification for their occasionalism. Antione Le Grand, for example, follows Descartes in maintaining that “we must conclude that all Creatures before God’s Decree were nothing, and consequently that of themselves they have no necessity to exist” (Philosophia veterum, I, II, 14, 72). Unlike Descartes, however, he is adamant that God’s concourse preserves things “not only as to the Existence, but as to their Essence also” (Ibid., 12, 70). That is, their particular states. Similarly, La Forge advances a powerful argument for the metaphysical powerlessness of bodies form the continual creation doctrine:

I…claim that there is no creature, spiritual or corporeal, which can cause change in it or in any of its parts, in the second moment of their creation, if the Creator does not do so himself. Since it was He who produced this part of matter in place A, for example, not only must he continue to produce it if he wishes it to continue to exist but also, since he cannot create it everywhere or nowhere, he must put it in place B himself if he wishes it to be there. (Traité, 147)

That is to say, even if a body is set in motion by God, it makes no sense to describe it as possessing motion or anything of the sort, for all motion can be in such a theological framework is the annihilation and recreation of the body in different places at different temporal intervals. This point, which revives the conception of motion held by the Islamic occasionalists, is finally made explicit by Malebranche: “The moving force of a body is, then, simply the efficacy of the volition of God who conserves it successively in different places” (Dialouges, VII.11, 159). Motion then is cinematographic: each successive frame bears no connection to the prior frame, there is no transference of properties among the depicted objects between each frame, and indeed the film itself (as a metaphor for substantiality) is patently incapable of such transmission:

[L]et us imagine that the ball is moved and that, in the line of its motion, it encounters another ball at rest…it is not the first ball that moves the second. That is clear from the [following] principle. One body could not move another without communicating to it some of its moving force. Now, the moving force of a body in motion is simply the volition of the Creator who conserves it successively in different places. It is not a quality that which belongs to the body.” (Dialouges, VII.11, 159)

4. The Place of Occasionalism in the History of Philosophy

For such a widely deprecated—if not forgotten—school of philosophy, occasionalism was nonetheless of staggering importance to the development of philosophical modernity. Locke declined to publish two essays he wrote against occasionalism because “he looked upon [occasionalism] to be an opinion that would not spread, but was to die of itself, or at least do no great harm” (Posthumous Works, 210). Locke was undoubtedly prescient in this estimation, but only because the influence of occasionalism was to be felt not in its positive metaphysic, but rather in its skeptical epistemology.

The first casualty of this skepticism was the chimerical Neoplatonism of Ammonius, Plotinus, and their many scions, which was virtually synonymous with philosophy itself in late-antiquity and the Early Middle Ages. It was this philosophy—taken to its apogee by Avicenna—that was the primary target of al-Ghazali’s withering criticism. Neo-Platonism never recovered from this assault (except perhaps in nineteenth-century German idealism) and was instead replaced by the classical Aristotelianism advanced by Muslim philosophers in al-Andalus, most notably Averroës. In the Latin West the order was somewhat reversed as the indigenous Platonism of Eriugena, William of Conches, and Abelard, was replaced by the influx of Aristotelian ideas arriving North from Moorish Spain. Yet, medieval philosophy did not find its “completion” in the Aristotelian scholasticism of William of Auvergne and Aquinas; for, following the condemnations of 1270 and 1277 and the University of Paris, many of which implicated the new Aristotelian theology, skeptical philosophy witnessed a resurgence in Western thought for the first time since antiquity.

Nominalism, the third and final of the great philosophical schools of the Middle Ages, was caustically critical of the pretentions of Thomism; and against such a metaphysic advanced many of the same logical and epistemological arguments made by al-Ghazali and the Islamic occasionalists. Neither Ockham nor Autrecourt were interested in developing a systematic metaphysics and thus refrained from pushing these arguments into an actual espousal of occasionalism. The importance of nominalism lies both in the counter it provided to the domination of Aristotelian scholasticism, as well as the not so minor fact that nominalism was the first rigorously empiricist philosophy in Western history. While certain philosophical schools of antiquity (namely Epicureanism and the Empiric medical school) had exhibited empiricist tendencies, the general inclination of ancient thought was to either combine—to the point of conflation—rational speculative reasoning with empirical observation, or to flatly privilege the former over the latter. No tradition of antiquity had justified empiricism to the same epistemological and metaphysical extent as did Ockham and his followers.

As ironic as it might seem concerning a theocentric metaphysics that regarded God as doing basically everything, the cardinal contribution of occasionalism, then, was to the development of an empiricist epistemology of causal explanation that stood as a cornerstone of modern philosophy and science. The hostility of the occasionalists to secondary causation and the natural potentialities of created things—which had been accepted virtually without question in antiquity—formed the basis of the early-modern attack on the occult forces and powers of scholasticism, not only in spirit but in the particular arguments employed as well. A commonly held belief of ancient metaphysics and natural philosophy was that the inviolable regularity of nature must be predicated on the natural activities of things. Even Sextus Empiricus, the arch-skeptic, warns: “if cause were non-existent everything would have been produced by everything and at random. Horses, for instance, might be born, perchance, of flies, and elephants of ants” (Outlines of Pyrrhonism, iii.18). This is a puzzling claim, for, if causality were indeed non-existent, nothing would produce anything. Yet, this is not how the ancient mind understood the metaphysics of causation: production was an ontological given, “causes” merely directed the power of the demiurge, ensuring that like produces like and so on. Such an understanding remained, in one form or another, down to Aquinas and Suaréz. Occasionalism, in rejecting the efficacy of such natural causes to guide the operations of Nature, was required to posit some principle in its place that would provide for the observed regularity and order therein. The occasionalist response was simple: given that God was the total cause of every event in nature, the regularity of the natural world was a direct extension of the regularity of the divine mind. In this way the ancient understanding of nature as governed by active powers and potentialities was replaced by the modern understanding of nature as governed by immutable laws. Lastly, the occasionalist rejection of the necessity of the connection between cause and effect had a direct and undeniable influence on Hume, who was a studious and astute reader of Malebranche (Treatise, 158-160). Moreover, it was precisely such a skeptical principle—and its obvious upshot that reality is non-deducible—that was to finally nail shut the coffin lid on rationalist-speculative natural philosophy once and for all.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources in English

  • Al-Ghazali. Tahafut Al-Falasifah. Translated by Sabih Ahmad Kamali. Lahore, Pakistan: Pakistan Philosophical Congress, 1963.
  • Autrecourt, Nicholas of. His Correspondence with Master Giles and Bernard of Arezzo. Translated by L.M. de Rijk. Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1994.
  • Autrecourt, Nicholas of. The Universal Treatise. Translated by Leonard A. Kennedy, Richard E. Arnold, and Arthur E. Millward. Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press, 1971.
  • Averroes. The Incoherence of the Incoherence. Translated by Simon van Den Bergh. 2 vol. London: Messrs Luzac & Company Ltd., 1969.
  • Avicenna. The Metaphysics of The Healing. Translated by Michael E. Marmura. Provo, UT: Brigham Young University Press, 2005.
  • Descartes, René. The Philosophical Writings of Descartes. Translated by John Cottingham et. al., 3 vol. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985.
  • Geulincx, Arnold. Metaphysics. Translated by Martin Wilson. Wisbech, UK: Christoffel Press, 1999
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. Edited by L.A. Selby-Bigge, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1957.
  • Hume, David. A Treatise on Human Nature. Edited by L.A. Selby-Bigge, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1955.
  • La Forge, Louis de. Treatise on the Human Mind. Translated by Desmond M. Clarke. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1997.
  • Maimonides, Moses. The Guide of the Perplexed. Translated by Shlomo Pines. Chicago, IL: The University of Chicago Press, 1963.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas. Dialogues on Metaphysics. Translated by Willis Doney. New York, NY: Abaris Books, 1980.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas. The Search After Truth. Translated by Thomas M. Lennon & Paul J. Olscamp. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1980.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas. Treatise on Nature and Grace. Translated by Patrick Riley. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992.
  • Ockham, William of. Philosophical Writings. Translated by Philotheus Boehner. Edinburgh: Nelson and Sons, 1957.

b. Secondary Sources

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  • Battail, Jean-François. L’avocate philosophe Géraud de Cordemoy. The Hauge, Martinus Nijhoff, 1973.
  • Binyamin Abrahamov. “Al-Ghazali’s Theory of Causality.” Studia Islamica 67 (1988): 75-98.
  • Clarke, Desmond. “Causal Powers and Occasionalism from Descartes to Malebranche.” In Descartes Natural Philosophy, edited by Stephen Gaukroger, John Schuster, and John Sutton, 131-148. London: Routledge, 2000.
  • Clatterbaugh, Kenneth. “Cartesian Causality, Explanation, and Divine Concurrence.” History of Philosophy Quaterly 12 (1995): 195-206.
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  • Courtenay, W. J. “The Critique on Natural Causality in the Mutakallimun and Nominalism.” Harvard Theological Review 66 (1973): 77-94.
  • Courtenay, W. J.“Nominalism and Late Medieval Religion” In The Pursuit of Holiness in Late Medieval and Renaissance Religion, edited by Charles Trinkas and Heiko A. Oberman, 26-59. Leiden: Brill, 1974.
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  • Curley, Edwin M. Descartes Against the Skeptics. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1978.
  • Doxsee, Carll Whitman. “Hume’s Relation to Malebranche,” The Philosophical Review 25 (1916): 692-710.
  • Fakhry, Majid. A History of Islamic Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1983.
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  • Gilson, Etienne. History of Christian Philosophy in the Middle Ages. New York: Random House, 1955.
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  • Goddu, André. “William of Ockham’s Distinction Between ‘Real’ Efficient Causes and Strictly Sine Qua Non Causes.” The Monist 79 (1996): 357-367.
  • Grant, Edward. God & Reason in the Middle Ages. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Grant, Robert M. Miracle and Natural Law in Graeco-Roman and Early Christian Thought. Amsterdam: North-Holland Publishing Company, 1952.
  • Griffel, Frank. “The Relationship between Averroes and al-Ghazali.” In Medieval Philosophy and the Classical Tradition: In Islam, Judaism and Christianity, edited by John Inglis, 51-63. London: RoutledgeCurzon, 2002.
  • Hattab, Helen. “Conflicting Causalities: The Jesuits, their Opponents, and Descartes on the Causality of the Efficient Cause.” In Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy Vol. 1, edited by Daniel Garber and Steven Nadler, 1-22. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Jolley, Nicolas. “Berkeley and Malebranche on Causality and Volition.” In Central Themes in Early Modern Philosophy, edited by J. A. Cover and Mark Kulstad, 227-244. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 1990.
  • Jolley, Nicolas. “Occasionalism and Efficacious Laws in Malebranche.” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 26 (2002): 245-257.
  • Jolley, Nicolas. “The Relation Between Theology and Philosophy.” In The Cambridge History of Seventeenth-Century Philosophy, edited by Daniel Garber and Michael Ayers, 363-392. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Kail, Peter. “On Hume’s Appropriation of Malebranche: Causation and Self,” European Journal of Philosophy 15 (2007): 1-26
  • Kockler, Harry, R. “Ockham and Efficient Causality,” Thomist 23 (1960): 106-123.
  • Kogan, Barry S. Averroes and the Metaphysics of Causation. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1985.
  • Kogan, Barry S. “The Philosophers al-Ghazali and Averroes on Necessary Connection and the Problem of the Miraculous.” In Islamic Philosophy and Mysticism, edited by Parviz Morewedge, 113-132. Delmar, NY: Caravan Books, 1981.
  • Lee, Sukjae. “Necessary Connections and Continuous Creation: Malebranche’s Two Arguments for Occasionalism.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 46 (2008): 539-66.
  • Lee, Sukjae. “Passive Natures and No Representations: Malebranche’s Two ‘Local’ Arguments for Occasionalism.” The Harvard Review of Philosophy 15 (2007): 72-91.
  • Lennon, Thomas M. The Battle of Gods and Giants: The Legacies of Descartes and Gassendi. 1655-1715, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1993.
  • Lennon, Thomas M. “The Cartesian Dialectic of Creation.” In The Cambridge History of Seventeenth-Century Philosophy, edited by Daniel Garber and Michael Ayers, 331-362. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Lennon, Thomas M. "Occasionalism and the Cartesian Metaphysic of Motion." Canadian Journal of Philosophy Suppl. 1 (1974): 29-40.
  • Lennon, Thomas M. “Veritas Filia Temporis: Hume on Time and Causation,” History of Philosophy Quarterly 2 (1995): 275-290.
  • MacDonald, D. B. “Continuous Recreation and Atomic Time in Muslim Scholastic Theology.” Isis 9 (1927): 326-344.
  • Marmura, Michael. “Causation in Islamic Thought.” Dictionary of the History of Ideas, edited by Philip P. Wiener, 286-289. New York: Scribner, 1973.
  • Maurer, Armand. The Philosophy of William of Ockham in the Light of Its Principles. Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies, 1999.
  • McCann, Hugh J., and Jonathan L. Kvanvig. “The Occasionalist Proselytizer: A Modified Catechism.” Philosophical Perspectives 5 (1991): 588-615.
  • McCracken, Charles J. Malebranche and British Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press, 1983.
  • McGinnis, Jon. “The Topology of Time: An Analysis of Medieval Islamic Accounts of Discrete and Continuous Time.” The Modern Schoolman 81 (2003): 5-25.
  • Moad, Omar Edward. “Al-Ghazali’s Occasionalism and the Nature of Creatures.” International Journal for the Philosophy of Religion 58 (2005): 1-8.
  • Moody, Ernest. “Empiricism and Metaphysics in Medieval Philosophy.” The Philosophical Review 67 (1958): 145-163.
  • Moody, Ernest. “Ockham, Buridan, and Nicholas of Autrecourt.” In Inquires into Medieval Philosophy, edited by James F. Ross, 275-314. Westport, CT: Greenwood Publishing Co., 1971.
  • Nadler, Steven. “Cordemoy and Occasionalism.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 43 (2005): 37-54.
  • Nadler, Steven. “Descartes and Occasional Causation.” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 2 (1994): 35-54.
  • Nadler, Steven. “Louis de La Forge and the Development of Occasionalism: Continuous Creation and the Activity of the Soul,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 36 (1998): 215-232.
  • Nadler, Steven. “Malebranche on Causation.” In The Cambridge Companion to Malebranche, edited by Steven Nadler, 112-138. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Nadler, Steven. “No Necessary Connection: The Medieval Roots of the Occasionalist Roots of Hume.” Monist 79 (1996): 448-466.
  • Nadler, Steven. “Occasionalism and General Will in Malebranche.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 31 (1993): 31-47.
  • Nadler, Steven. “Occasionalism and the Mind-Body Problem.” In Studies in Seventeenth-Century European Philosophy, edited by M. A. Stewart, 75-95. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1997.
  • Nadler, Steven. “Occasionalism and the Question of Arnauld’s Cartesianism.” In Descartes and His Contemporaries, edited by Roger Ariew and Marjorie Greene, 129-144. Chicago: University of Chicago press, 1995.
  • Nadler, Steven. “The Occasionalism of Louis de La Forge.” In Causation in Early Modern Philosophy, edited by Steven Nadler, 57-73. University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press, 1993.
  • Oakley, Francis. Omnipotence, Covenant, & Order: An Excursion in the History of Ideas from Abelard to Leibniz. Ithica, NY: Cornell University Press, 1984.
  • Ott, Walter. Causation and Laws of Nature in Early Modern Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Ott, Walter. “Causation, Intentionality, and the Case for Occasionalism.” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 90 (2008):165-187.
  • Pines, Shlomo. Studies in Islamic Atomism. Edited by Tzvi Langermann. Translated by Michael Schwarz. Jerusalem: The Magnes Press, 1997.
  • Pyle, Andrew. Malebranche. New York: Routledge, 2003.
  • Quinn, Philip L. “Divine Conservation, Secondary Causes, and Occasionalism.” In Divine and Human Action: Essays in the Metaphysics of Theism, edited by Thomas V. Morris, 13-49. Ithica, NY: Cornell University Press, 1988.
  • Radner, Daisie. Malebranche: A Study of a Cartesian System. Amsterdam: Van Gorcum Assen, 1978.
  • Radner, Daisie. “Occasionalism.” In Routledge History of Philosophy, vol. 4: The Renaissance and 17th Century Rationalism, edited by G. H. R. Parkinson, 349-383. London: Routledge, 1993.
  • Rashdall, Hastings. “Nicholas de Ultricuria, A Medieval Hume.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 7 (1907): 1-27.
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  • Schmaltz, Tad M Steven Nadler, 152-166. Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2002.
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Author Information

Jason Jordan
Email: jjordan4@uoregon.edu
University of Oregon
U. S. A.

Hadot, Pierre

Pierre Hadot (1922-2010)

Pierre HadotPierre Hadot, classical philosopher and historian of philosophy, is best known for his conception of ancient philosophy as a bios or way of life (manière de vivre). His work has been widely influential in classical studies and on thinkers, including Michel Foucault. According to Hadot, twentieth- and twenty-first-century academic philosophy has largely lost sight of its ancient origin in a set of spiritual practices that range from forms of dialogue, via species of meditative reflection, to theoretical contemplation.  These philosophical practices, as well as the philosophical discourses the different ancient schools developed in conjunction with them, aimed primarily to form, rather than only to inform, the philosophical student. The goal of the ancient philosophies, Hadot argued, was to cultivate a specific, constant attitude toward existence, by way of the rational comprehension of the nature of humanity and its place in the cosmos. This cultivation required, specifically, that students learn to combat their passions and the illusory evaluative beliefs instilled by their passions, habits, and upbringing. To cultivate philosophical discourse or writing without connection to such a transformed ethical comportment was, for the ancients, to be as a rhetorician or a sophist, not a philosopher. However, according to Hadot, with the advent of the Christian era and the eventual outlawing, in 529 C.E., of the ancient philosophical schools, philosophy conceived of as a bios largely disappeared from the West. Its spiritual practices were integrated into, and adapted by, forms of Christian monasticism. The philosophers’ dialectical techniques and metaphysical views were integrated into, and subordinated, first to revealed theology and then, later, to the modern natural sciences. However, Hadot maintained that the conception of philosophy as a bios has never completely disappeared from the West, resurfacing in Montaigne, Rousseau, Goethe, Thoreau, Nietzsche, and Schopenhauer, and even in the works of Descartes, Spinoza, Kant, and Heidegger.

Hadot’s conception of ancient philosophy and his historical narrative of its disappearance in the West have provoked both praise and criticism. Hadot received a host of letters from students around the world telling him that his works had changed their lives, perhaps the most fitting tribute given the nature of Hadot’s meta-philosophical claims. Unlike many of his European contemporaries, Hadot’s work is characterized by lucid, restrained prose; clarity of argument; the near-complete absence of recondite jargon; and a gentle, if sometimes self-depreciating, humor. While Hadot was an admirer of Nietzsche and Heidegger, and committed to a kind of philosophical recasting of the history of Western ideas, Hadot’s work lacks any eschatological sense of the end of philosophy, humanism, or the West. Late in life, Hadot would report that this was because he was animated by the sense that philosophy, as conceived and practiced in the ancient schools, remains possible for men and women of his era: “from 1970 on, I have felt very strongly that it was Epicureanism and Stoicism which could nourish the spiritual life of men and women of our times, as well as my own” (PWL 280).

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Philology and Method
  3. Early Work: Plotinus and the Simplicity of Vision
  4. What is Ancient Philosophy?
    1. Philosophical Discourse versus Philosophy
    2. Philosophy as a Way of Life
    3. The Figure of Socrates
    4. The Figure of the Sage
  5. Spiritual Practices
    1. Askesis of Desire
    2. Premeditation of Death and Evils
    3. Concentration on the Present Moment
    4. The View from Above
    5. Writing as Hypomnemata, and The Inner Citadel
  6. The Transformation of Philosophy after the Decline of Antiquity
    1. The Adoption of Spiritual Practices in Monasticism
    2. Philosophical Discourse as Handmaiden to Theology and the Natural Sciences
    3. The Permanence of the Ancient Conception of Philosophy
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Works in French
    2. Works in English
    3. Selected Articles on Hadot

1. Biography

Pierre Hadot was born in Paris in 1922.  Educated as a Catholic, at age 22 Hadot began training for the priesthood. However, following Pope Pius XII's encyclical, Humani Generis, of 1950, Hadot left the priesthood, marrying for a first time in 1953. Between 1953 and 1962, Hadot studied the Latin patristics and was trained in philology. At this time, Hadot was also greatly interested in mysticism. In 1963, he published Plotinus: or The Simplicity of Vision, on the great Neoplatonic philosopher. During this period he also produced two of the first studies about Wittgenstein written in the French-language. Hadot was elected director of studies at the fifth section of the École Pratique des Hautes Études in 1964, and he married his is second wife, the historian of philosophy Ilsetraut Hadot, in 1966. From the mid-1960s, Hadot’s attention turned to wider studies in ancient thought, culminating in two key works: Exercices spirituels et philosophie antique, written in 1981 (translated into English in 1995 as Philosophy as a Way of Life [PWL] ) and Qu'est-ce que la philosophie antique?, written in 1995 (translated into English in 2002 as What is Ancient Philosophy? [WAP] ). Hadot was named professor at the Collège de France in 1982, where he held the chair for the History of Greek and Roman Thought (chaire d'histoire de la pensée hellénistique et romaine). Hadot retired from this position to become professeur honoraire at the Collège in 1991. He continued to translate, write, give interviews, and publish until shortly before his death in April 2010.

2. Philology and Method

Hadot would always insist that his groundbreaking work on ancient philosophy as a way of life arose from his early academic training as a philologist. Throughout his career, Hadot was involved in compiling, editing, and translating ancient Latin and Greek texts, including Marcus Aurelius’ Meditations, Ambrose of Milan’s Apology of David, Plotinus’ works, and as well as the theological works of the Roman rhetorician Marius Victorinus. The study of philology, Hadot claimed, was beneficial for him first of all as a kind of ethical exercise, engendering interpretive humility and attention to historical and textual detail. Secondly, it led him to raise the strictly literary problem concerning the way ancient philosophy was written. His reflections on this problem led Hadot to the meta-philosophical considerations concerning philosophy as a way of life seen in his mature work. Generally speaking, Hadot observed, “the philosophical works of Greco-Roman antiquity almost always perplex . . . contemporary readers . . . even . . . specialists in the field” (PWL 61). The reason is the apparently strange, disordered, circumlocutory, even incoherent nature of ancient philosophical writings, whether we consider Plato’s dialogues with their literary settings, myths or “likely stories”; the occasional letters of an Epicurus or a Seneca; Marcus Aurelius’ apparently desultory notes, injunctions, and aphorisms; or even Aristotle’s reputedly more “systematic” works, which are nevertheless often repetitious, punctuated by digressions, and sometimes inconclusive.

According to Hadot, these literary features seem odd only insofar as readers try, erroneously, to read ancient texts with presuppositions shaped by their reading of modern authors. Philosophical authors in the twenty-first century write under very different social, political, institutional, and technological constraints than their ancient antecedents.  In order to understand why the ancient philosophers wrote as they did, Hadot argued, readers need to cultivate a historical sense of “the concrete conditions in which they wrote, all the constraints that weighed upon them: the framework of the school, the very nature of philosophia, literary genres, rhetorical rules, dogmatic imperatives, and traditional modes of reasoning” (PWL 61). Readers must be prepared, in this light, to distinguish between what an author may have wanted to say, as against what he was required in his specific tradition and context to say, and what he was likewise obliged to pass over or leave unsaid” (PWL 64; PAH 64).

In different works, Hadot specified these constraints shaping the ancient philosophical texts. The ancient texts were dictated to scribes and intended to be read aloud. In general, ancient culture was one in which writing was still a relatively new phenomenon, set against the wider primacy of the spoken word—as reflected in the famous Platonic criticisms of writing. Ancient philosophy was largely carried out in the form of spoken dialogue between students and their teachers, so that—as Socrates had already insisted (4c)—students would be drawn to actively discover the truth on their own. Hadot suggests that by recognizing how these works retain and mirror the features of the spoken interchanges upon which they were modeled, modern readers can begin to understand many of the characteristic hesitations, starts and stops, repetitions, and digressions in ancient texts.

The oral bases of ancient philosophical teaching are again reflected in considerations concerning the addressees of these works. “Unlike their modern counterparts, none of these philosophical productions, even the systematic works, is addressed to everyone,” Hadot argued (PWL 64). The exceptions here are expressly exoteric texts like the Platonic dialogues, written with the “protreptic” purpose of attracting new students to philosophy, or like Aristotle’s practical writings, which are specifically addressed to potential statesmen or legislators (WAP 90). Otherwise, ancient philosophical writings were conceived within, and directed toward the members of, the philosophical schools. They reflect the philosophical subjects, techniques, and propositions developed in oral exercises, classes, and teachings, as well as the wider goals of philosophical paideia (4a).

In order to understand the form and intention of many ancient works, Hadot emphasized, the reader must understand the institutional frameworks of the ancient philosophical schools (the Platonic academy, the Aristotelian Lyceum, the Stoa, the Epicurean garden, and the later Platonist schools). Aristotle’s extant works, which were lecture notes seemingly compiled by students or a later redactor within the Lyceum, are only the most obvious case. Part of the curricula in Platonic and Stoic schools, Hadot emphasized, were formalized exercises in dialectics: discussing, through questions and answers, particular theses (such as, “virtue can be taught”) in a way which goes toward explaining the preeminence of the dialogue form in ancient philosophical writing. Even the later, more systematic forms of philosophical treatise that emerged within Platonism in particular, Hadot claimed, must be understood “from the perspective of dialectical and exegetical scholarly exercises” as attempts to synthesize and order the whole of doctrine which had emerged with the school (PWL 63-4). Again, particularly in the imperial period of late antiquity, a large amount of ancient philosophical writings and teaching began to study commentary rather than the original works of  the different schools. This was a literary genre in which great weight was given to arguments from authority, in a way that anticipated the medieval scholastics.  Different philosophical traditions developed particular stylistic features, such as characteristic images, turns of phrase, or highly formulaic dogmata, which later exegetes were more or less compelled to use, “independent, if one may say so, of the author’s will” (PWL 62).

Hadot’s work in philology, and his sensitivity to the institutional and traditional constraints shaping ancient works, gave rise in his thought to an acute sense of the role played in the history of thought by misappropriations, mistranslations, and creative mistakes.  The high status afforded in later classical thought to formulae, images, phrases, and patterns of argument in the schools’ founding texts saw many instances of these philosophical formulae (like “know thyself” or “nature loves to hide”) being borrowed, misappropriated, and given new meaning in the texts of different philosophical traditions, and in the encounter between Hellenistic paganism and Jewish and Christian monotheisms. Later exegetes’ determination to systematize earlier texts and to render them wholly consistent in the light of accepted understandings, together with the supposition that earlier masters could neither be mistaken nor contradict themselves, led to problematic or arbitrary systematizations which nevertheless underlay important evolutions in the history of ideas. Hadot adduces in this context the four- or five-tiered Neoplatonic ontological hierarchies drawn from Plato’s dialogues and Augustine’s positing of a “heaven of heavens” on the basis of a Greek mistranslation of Psalm 113:16. Hadot devoted an early essay to showing how the entire Neoplatonic interpretation of the Parmenides, a subject of great later importance, rested on Porphyry’s erroneous introduction of a distinction between “being” (Gr. ousia) as an infinitive (Fr. être) and as a participle (Fr: étant) to explain the “pure transcendental act” (étant) of the One Beyond Being (être).

3. Early Work: Plotinus and the Simplicity of Vision

Hadot’s first book, Plotinus, or the Simplicity of Vision, was published in 1963. It shows the first fruits of his philological training over the previous decade and his distinct perspective upon ancient philosophical writings. The book was commissioned as a title in a series of works on the lives, or psychobiographies, of famous authors. Hadot begins by underlining the difficulties associated with trying to write a biography of a thinker about whose life we have little testimony (PSV 77-78), who blushed even at having his portrait made, and whose entire philosophy was devoted to the transcendence of his mundane, bodily self —as a sculptor transforms the stone upon which he works (PSV 21; Enneads I.6, 9). Hadot also urges caution, as he will later in his writings on Aurelius (5a) in trying to infer any biographical or psychological insight concerning the author from a work like PlotinusEnneads, whose modes of arguing, and many of whose images and figures of speech, “are not spontaneous: [but] traditional and imposed by the texts to be commented upon” in the Platonic heritage of which Plotinus was a legatee (PSV 17).

With that said, Plotinus, or the Simplicity of Vision (PSV) importantly anticipates many of Hadot’s later arguments on ancient philosophy.  Hadot tells us in the autobiographical interviews of The Present Alone is Our Happiness that as a young man, he had undergone some kind of mystical experience (PAH 5-6). This was an experience that shaped Hadot’s own initial scholarly research, including several of the first French-language articles on Wittgenstein’s philosophy, and his continuing interest in “unitary experience.” It can, arguably, be seen to underlie Hadot’s repeated, central claim that the classical philosophies were rooted in certain paradigmatic experiences of existence (4b). In any case, Hadot argues in PSV that the famous Neoplatonic metaphysics of the One, the Ideas, and the world-psyche is not the abstract, purely theoretical, otherworldly construction it is often presented as being. Rather, Hadot claims, in Plotinus’ Enneads the language of metaphysics “is used to express an inner experience. All these levels of reality become levels of inner life, levels of the self” (PSV 27).  For Hadot, Plotinus’ metaphysical discourse is animated by a “fundamental but inexpressible experience.” This is what gives his work a “unique, incomparable, and irreplaceable tonality” despite Plotinus’ open and avowed citation of inherited Platonic tropes and arguments (PSV 19). For Hadot, Plotinus’ system revolves around the core, existential claim that the human self is not irrevocably separated from its eternal model, the transcendent One or Good. Indeed, at the height of the philosopher’s contemplative ascent, we are called to supra-intellectual identity with this Good: “We then become this eternal self, we are moved by unutterable beauty . . . we identify ourselves with divine Thought itself” (PSV 27). The only autobiographical passage in the Enneads, Hadot notes, involves Plotinus’ testimony about this mystical union (“I become One with the divine, and I establish myself in it” (Enneads IV 8, 1 4), whose content is such that the philosopher is drawn to wonder “how is it possible that I should come down now, and how was it ever possible for my soul to come to be within my body . . .” (Enneads IV 8, 1, 8-9; PSV 25).

In Hadot’s later writings, Plotinus’ philosophical discourse cannot be separated from, but is rather rooted in, the spiritual biography of the philosopher himself. Indeed, PSV already stresses the way that in classical antiquity, certainly in the imperial era of Plotinus, philosophy involved the call to a transformation of individuals’ way of living: a “conversion of attention,” away from “vain preoccupations and exaggerated worries” (PSV 30-31). The philosophical master like Plotinus, in this setting, was less a professor or teacher in modes we would recognize, than a spiritual guide. In Hadot’s words: “he exhorted his charges to conversion, and then directed his new converts . . . . to the paths of wisdom. He was a spiritual advisor” (PSV 75-6). Nevertheless, Porphyry reports that even Plotinus himself was able to achieve mystical union with the One, or Good, only four times in the six years Porphyry was at the master’s school in Rome. The philosopher can at most prepare himself and his charges for such ultimately passive, or receptive, experiences of unity with the Good (compare PSV 55-56). The means to prepare oneself was through the practice of spiritual exercises such as dietary (and other) forms of ascesis (PSV 82) and regular contemplative practices. More than this, PSV situates Plotinus’ later preoccupation with ethical concerns, and cultivating the virtues of benevolence, gentleness, simplicity, and respect for others as part of a kind of ever-renewed effort of the philosopher, between his transitory, mystical experiences, to remain mindful of the higher Good he has contemplatively glimpsed (PSV 65, 86).

For all of Hadot’s evident enthusiasm for Plotinus’ philosophy, however, PSV concludes with an assessment of the modern world’s inescapable distance from Plotinus’ thought and experience. Hadot distances himself from Plotinus' negative assessment of bodily existence, and he also displays a caution in his support for mysticism, citing the skeptical claims of Marxism and psychoanalysis about professed mysticism, considering it a lived mystification or obfuscation of truth (PSV 112-113). Hadot would later recall that, after writing the book in a month and returning to ordinary life, he had his own uncanny experience: “. . . seeing the ordinary folks all around me in the bakery, I  . . .  had the impression of having lived a month in another world, completely foreign to our world, and worse than this—totally unreal and even unlivable.” Hadot’s work after 1965 increasingly turned away from Neoplatonism, in particular, and the phenomena of mysticism, in general, and to studies of the divergent ancient philosophical schools, especially those of the Hellenistic and Roman, or imperial, eras.

4. What is Ancient Philosophy?

a. Philosophical Discourse versus Philosophy

Hadot often stressed that his conception of philosophy as a way of life, long before this idea became fashionable, emerged out of the scholarly attempt to understand the unusual literary forms of ancient philosophical writing (see 2). Hadot emphasized that he in no way denied or wanted to downplay “the extraordinary ability of the ancient philosophers to develop theoretical reflection on the most subtle problems of the theory of knowledge, logic, or physics.” Nevertheless, if modern readers are to understand how this theoretical reflection is conveyed in extant ancient writings, Hadot argued that readers are compelled to adopt a perspective “different from that which corresponds to the idea people usually have of philosophy” (WAP 3).

According to Hadot’s position as developed in What is Ancient Philosophy?, philosophical discourse must in particular be situated within a wider conception of philosophy that sees philosophy as necessarily involving a kind of existential choice or commitment to a specific way of living one’s entire life. According to Hadot, one became an ancient Platonist, Aristotelian, or Stoic in a manner more comparable to the twenty-first century understanding of religious conversion, rather than the way an undergraduate or graduate student chooses to accept and promote, for example, the theoretical perspectives of Nietzsche, Badiou, Davidson, or Quine. Hadot cites as a particularly striking instance the case of Polemo, later head of the Academy, who decided then and there to adopt the Platonic philosophical bios after being dared by friends to listen to a lecture of Xenocrates after a night of drunken debauchery (WAP 98).What was involved in such cases was not solely the student’s intellectual assent to an intellectual doctrine or “-ism” in more or less complete isolation from the student’s wider life. Rather, one feature of philosophical writings across different schools was a sometimes caustic criticism of men who professed some teaching or refined way of speaking “ . . . but contradict themselves in the conduct of their own lives.” As Hadot writes in WAP, “According to the Stoic Epictetus, [such people] talk about the art of living like human beings, instead of living like human beings themselves . . . as Seneca put it, they turn true love of wisdom (philosophia) into love of words (philologia).” Traditionally, people who developed an apparently philosophical discourse without trying to live their lives in accordance with their discourse, and without their discourse emanating from their life experience, were called sophists (WAP 174).

Hadot argues in this light that ancient philosophical writings must always be situated in relation to the existential choice of a certain mode of living that characterizes the different ancient philosophies (4b; WAP 3). This need can be seen clearly enough by considering the different genres, or language games, of ancient philosophical writings, and noting specifically that these included letters addressed to individual students’ concerns (Seneca, Epicurus); meditations, or hypomnemata (memory aids), addressed by the student to himself (as in the case of Marcus Aurelius) (5a); consolations against loss and hardships (Boethius, Seneca); studies devoted to mundane stations in life (Of Marriage [Cleanthes], On Leisure [Seneca]); biographies of philosophers (Xenephon, Diogenes Laertius); and works enjoining particular practical conduct (Of Just Dealings [Epicurus], How to Live Amongst Men [Diogenes]). But in WAP, Hadot specifies a series of particular ways philosophical writings relate to ancient philosophy, conceived of as some specific choice of a manière de vivre. First, philosophical discourse aims to do specific things with words, concerning those who will read them. Philosophical discourse, in Hadot’s words, “is a privileged means by which the philosopher can act upon himself and others: for if it is the expression of the existential option of the person who utters it, discourse always has, directly or indirectly, a function which is formative, educative, psychagogic, and therapeutic” (WAP 176). Hadot sometimes cites in this connection Epicurus’ justification for his pursuit of theoretical physics: to reassure mortals against fear concerning death and our imaginings of active, interventionist gods. But here also Hadot’s stress (see 2) on the spoken, dialogic foundation and model for many ancient writings applies. As when we speak directly to a particular individual, so ancient philosophical discourse “is always intended to produce an effect, a habitus within the soul, or to provoke a transformation of the self” of its addressee. (loc cit.)  Secondly, in a way closer to how philosophy tends to be conceived of today, philosophical discourse involved the construction of more or less formalized systems—but this was in order to explain and justify the different schools’ different conceptions of the good life. Whichever philosophical school’s conception of the good life  is chosen, Hadot explains, “it will be necessary to disengage the presuppositions, implications, and consequences of each attitude with great precision” (WAP 175). It was on this primarily practical basis that the different ancient schools each developed their own technical languages, metaphysical conceptions of humanity’s place within the cosmos, ethical teachings defining one’s relationship to others, and epistemological doctrines about the rules of correct reasoning and argument (WAP 176). Characteristically, Hadot stresses that even the later exegetical systematizations, treatises, and dense summaries of doctrine that emerged in later antiquity were related to the exigencies associated with trying to form students who lived in a certain manner. For this to be possible, students (prokopta) would need to be able at any time to call to mind the school’s key precepts, in particular when they faced temptations or difficulties in their lives. Such a timely recollection of the rules of life was facilitated by having these systematizations and summaries available as written hypomnemata (WAP 176-7).

b. Philosophy as a Way of Life

Hadot’s founding meta-philosophical claim is that since the time of Socrates, in ancient philosophy “the choice of a way of life [was] not . . . located at the end of the process of philosophical activity, like a kind of accessory or appendix. On the contrary, its stands at the beginning, in a complex interrelationship with critical reaction to other existential attitudes . . .” (WAP 3). All the schools agreed that philosophy involves the individual’s love of and search for wisdom. All also agreed, although in different terms, that this wisdom involved “first and foremost . . . a state of perfect peace of mind,” as well as a comprehensive view of the nature of the whole and humanity’s place within it. They concurred that attaining to such Sophia, or wisdom, was the highest Good for human beings. All ancient philosophical schools agreed that, by contrast, most people live unwise lives most of the time. These lives are characterized by unnecessary forms of suffering and disorder, caused by their ignorance or unconsciousness concerning the true source of human happiness. In the view of all philosophical schools, Hadot claims that “mankind’s principal cause of suffering, disorder and unconsciousness were the passions: that is, unregulated desires and exaggerated fears. People are prevented from truly living, it was taught, because they are dominated by the passions” (PWL 83). Political society in all but the best regimes, while natural to human beings, was agreed to be a further cause of individuals’ having deeply habituated, false beliefs concerning human nature and concerning what is good for them to pursue and to avoid. Ancient philosophers thus conceived of philosophy as involving a therapy of the soul, or “remedy for human worries, anguish, and misery brought about for the Cynics, by social constraints and conventions; for the Epicureans, by the quest for false pleasures; for the Stoics, by the pursuit of pleasure and egoistic self-interest; and for the skeptics, by false opinions” (WAP 102).

The disagreements between the ancient philosophies concerned the way the happiness of wisdom was to be conceived of and pursued. For Epicureanism, wisdom involved the pursuit of a particular species of pleasure; whereas for Platonism, Aristotelianism, and Stoicism, some conception of virtue or the Good was prioritized as the one necessary element. But the Platonic conception of this Good, of course, differs markedly from the Peripatetic and Stoic ideals. Each philosophical perspective, Hadot moreover claims, responded to a different, specific experience of the world: as in Epicureanism, “the voice of the flesh: ‘not to be hungry, not to be thirsty, not to be cold’ ” (WAP 115); or in Stoicism, the sense expressed by Epictetus that people are unhappy because they passionately seek things which they cannot obtain and flee evils which are inevitable (WAP 127). Then there are the disagreements between the ancient schools concerning the place and role of intellectual contemplation, and the elaboration of theoretical dogmata, in pursuing the good life. These range from the Aristotelian approach, which seeks out what Aristotle, in the opening pages of The Parts of Animals, calls the “incredible pleasure” (645a7) of investigating and contemplating all the works of nature as an end in itself; to the skeptics’ position, which sought eudaimonia (happiness, or welfare) through suspending judgment altogether; to the Cynics, “for whom philosophical discourse was reduced to a minimum—sometimes to mere gestures” (WAP 83, 173). Nevertheless, Hadot more typically stresses the commonalities between the ancient philosophical schools and conceptions of philosophy, insofar as each involved “… a complete reversal of received ideas: one was to renounce the false values of wealth, honors, and pleasures, and turn towards the true value of virtue, contemplation, a simple life-style, and the simple happiness of existing”. This radical opposition explains the reaction of nonphilosophers, which ranged from the mockery we find expressed in the comic poets, to the outright hostility that led to the death of Socrates (PWL 104).

c. The Figure of Socrates

It was with the figure of Socrates that ancient philosophy distinguished itself from its ancient precedents: the rhetorical education of the sophists, the discourses of the pre-Socratic physikoi and historians, the sayings and lives of the seven sages, and the aristocratic concern with the paideia, or upbringing, of young men (WAP 9-21). Socrates inspired nearly all subsequent ancient philosophic schools, either directly, through students like Plato, Xenophon, Aristippus, Euclides, and Antisthenes, or indirectly, via the writings of Plato in particular, as a kind of ethical ideal in the Stoic school, and as a mythical, Silenic figure central to the entirety of subsequent Western intellectual life. In Philosophy as a Way of Life, Hadot devotes an entire chapter of WAP to “the figure of Socrates,” as well as a long, beautiful essay exploring Socrates’ atopia (enigmatic nature) and the extraordinary responses his life has inspired, focusing particularly on Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Hadot’s Socrates anticipates and sets the mold for all the ancient philosophies as ways of life. First, Socrates associated the philosophic life with a revaluation of accepted normative commitments of his society and with a studied indifference toward the things his contemporaries coveted (wealth, status, property, public office, political disputes), as attested by his appearance, dress, and absence of gainful employment (compare Apo. 36b). Second, as Plato’s Alcibiades famously attests in the Symposium, Socrates overturned accepted, inherited models of wisdom, in his discourse as much as in his person, as well as through his repeated ironic claims, that he lacked any kind of higher wisdom, saying that he was only a midwife for the ideas of others, or was like a gadfly stirring his fellows from ethical complacency. He is identified in Plato’s Symposium with the daimonic Eros, mediating between human beings and the gods, but not for that reason divine himself (PWL 158-165).Third, Hadot’s Socrates is the first, unsurpassable practitioner of philosophic dialogue conceived of as what Hadot calls a “spiritual exercise” (compare 5) designed to actively implicate the other in the Socratic process of doubting received opinions and seeking to render one’s own beliefs consistent. For Hadot, “in the Socratic dialogue, the real question is less what is being talked about than who is doing the talking,” as Nikias attests in the Laches, when the latter notes that whichever topic Socrates’ interlocutor may raise, “he will continually be carried round and round by him, until at last he finds that he has to give an account both of his present and past life” (Laches 197e; WAP 28; PWL 155). Fourth, Hadot notes that when Socrates does attest to having some kinds of knowledge, in the famous Socratic paradoxes—that no one does evil voluntarily, that it is better to suffer than to do wrong, and that the good man cannot be harmed—this knowledge is of a specifically ethical kind, concerning how to live, and what is good or bad for the psyche: “Socrates does not know the value to be attributed to death, because it is not in his power . . . Yet he does know the value of moral action and intention, for they do depend on his choice, his decision, and his engagement . . .” (WAP 83, 84). In other words, in Hadot’s Socrates, care for the self and care for others coincided with Socrates’ sense of what Hadot calls “the absolute value of moral intent: a philosophical commitment embodied in Socrates’ dialogical calling, “to try to persuade all of you to concern yourself less about what he has than about what he is . . .” (Apo. 36c). Above all, Hadot stresses that throughout antiquity Socrates was the model of the philosopher whose work was, above all, his own life, death, and example: “He was the first to show that at all times and all places, in everything that happens to us, daily life gives the opportunity to do philosophy” (Plutarch, at WAP 38).

d. The Figure of the Sage

A further, too-often neglected feature of the ancient conception on philosophy as a way of life, Hadot argues, was a set of discourses aiming to describe the figure of the Sage. The Sage was the living embodiment of wisdom, “the highest activity human beings can engage in . . . which is linked intimately to the excellence and virtue of the soul” (WAP 220). Across the schools, Socrates himself was agreed to have been perhaps the only living exemplification of such a figure (his avowed agnoia notwithstanding). Pyrrho and Epicurus were also accorded this elevated status in their respective schools, just as Sextius and Cato were deemed sages by Seneca, and Plotinus by Porphyry. Yet more important than documenting the lives of historical philosophers (although this was another ancient literary genre) was the idea of the Sage as “transcendent norm.” The aim, by picturing such figures, was to give “an idealized description of the specifics of the way of life” that was characteristic of the each of the different schools (WAP 224). The philosophical Sage, in all the ancient discourses, is characterized by a constant inner state of happiness or serenity. This has been achieved through minimizing his bodily and other needs, and thus attaining to the most complete independence (autarcheia) vis-à-vis external things. The Sage is for this reason capable of maintaining virtuous resolve and clarity of judgment in the face of the most overwhelming threats, from natural catastrophes to “the fury of citizens who ordain evil . . . [or] the face of a threatening tyrant” (Horace in WAP 223). In the different ancient schools, these characteristics differentiating the Sage from nonphilosophers mean that this figure “tends to become very close to God or the gods,” as conceived by the philosophers. The Epicurean gods, like the God of Aristotle, Hadot notes, are characterized by their perfect serenity and exemption from all troubles and dangers. Epicurus calls the Sage the friend of the gods, and the gods friends of the Sages. Aristotle equates the contemplation of the wise man with the self-contemplation of the unmoved mover. Platonic philosophy sees ascent in wisdom as progressive assimilation to the divine (WAP 226-7). Hadot goes as far as to suggest that Plotinus and other ancient philosophers “project” the figure of the God, on the basis of their conception of the figure of the Sage, as a kind of model of human and intellectual perfection” (WAP 227-8). However, Hadot stresses that the divine freedom of the Sage from the concerns of ordinary human beings does not mean the Sage lacks all concern for the things that preoccupy other human beings. Indeed, in a series of remarkable analyses, Hadot argues that this indifference towards external goods (money, fame, property, office . . . ) opens the Sage to a different, elevated state of awareness in which he “never ceases to have the whole present in his mind, never forgets the world, thinks and acts in relation to the cosmos . . . ” (Bernhard Groethuysen in WAP 229). The Stoic Sage who has realized that external things do not depend upon his will, for instance, is prompted to accept these “indifferents” with equal benevolence or equanimity (the famous amor fati, or love of fate, later adopted by Nietzsche). In “The Sage and the World,” Hadot analyzes the peculiar phenomenology of this “detached, disinterested consciousness” in Lucretius and Seneca, aligning their thoughts with modern discourse on aesthetic perception, Rousseau’s famous “sensation of existence,” and Bergson’s conception of philosophical perception (PWL 253-6). The perception of the Sage constantly views things with the wonder of seeing the world for the first time (PWL 257-8), or as others see things only when a sense of their mortality, and therefore the unique singularity of each moment and experience, is imposed upon them (PWL 260).

5. Spiritual Practices

a. Askesis of Desire

For Hadot, famously, the means for the philosophical student to achieve the “complete reversal of our usual ways of looking at things” epitomized by the Sage were a series of spiritual exercises. These exercises encompassed all of those practices still associated with philosophical teaching and study: reading, listening, dialogue, inquiry, and research. However, they also included practices deliberately aimed at addressing the student’s larger way of life, and demanding daily or continuous repetition: practices of attention (prosoche), meditations (meletai), memorizations of dogmata, self-mastery (enkrateia), the therapy of the passions, the remembrance of good things, the accomplishment of duties, and the cultivation of indifference towards indifferent things (PWL 84). Hadot acknowledges his use of the term “spiritual exercises” may create anxieties, by associating philosophical practices more closely with religious devotion than typically done (Nussbaum 1996, 353-4; Cooper 2010). Hadot’s use of the adjective “spiritual” (or sometimes “existential”) indeed aims to capture how these practices, like devotional practices in the religious traditions (6a), are aimed at generating and reactivating a constant way of living and perceiving in prokopta, despite the distractions, temptations, and difficulties of life. For this reason, they call upon far more than “reason alone.” They also utilize rhetoric and imagination in order “to formulate the rule of life to ourselves in the most striking and concrete way” and aim to actively re-habituate bodily passions, impulses, and desires (as for instance, in Cynic or Stoic practices, abstinence is used to accustom followers to bear cold, heat, hunger, and other privations) (PWL 85). These practices were used in the ancient schools in the context of specific forms of interpersonal relationships: for example, the relationship between the student and a master, whose role it was to guide and assist the student in the examination of conscience, in identification and rectification of erroneous judgments and bad actions, and in the conduct of dialectical exchanges on established themes.

b. Premeditation of Death and Evils

Perhaps the most well-known philosophical spiritual exercise is the Stoic practice of the premeditation of evils. In this exercise, the students are exhorted to present to their minds, in advance, the possible evils that may befall them in the course of their upcoming endeavors, so as to limit the force of their possible fear, anger, or sadness, should these evils occur. Galen recommends that at the beginning of each day individuals try to call to mind all they have to do in the course of the day ahead, envisaging the ways things may go awry, and recalling the principles that should guide them in their actions; Marcus, similarly, enjoins himself to anticipate each day that he will encounter envious, ungrateful, overbearing, treacherous, and selfish men (Med. II.1) Plato’s Socrates, in the Phaedo, famously comforts his friends by suggesting that philosophy is learning how to die. Taking this Platonic statement as emblematic of a wider philosophical exercise, Hadot stresses that repeated meditation upon one’s mortality, and the possible immanence of one’s death, was a spiritual exercise practiced across the philosophical schools. This exercise was not an exercise in morbidity or life-denial, so much as a means to focus the philosopher’s attention on the “infinite value” of each instant and action in  life (5c). In Stoic texts, we read injunctions to “hurry up and live” (Seneca, at WAP 194). Horace’s famous carpe diem from the Odes in like manner reminds us that “Life ebbs as I speak: so seize each day, and grant the next no credit” (PWL 88). As in “practical physics” (5d), meditating upon one’s mortality in such exercises is also prescribed as a way of dying to one’s individuality and passions, so the philosopher learns to look at things from the perspective of universality or objectivity.

c. Concentration on the Present Moment

Constant, renewed attention to the present moment, Hadot argues, “ . . . is, in a sense, the key to spiritual exercises” (PWL 84). The philosophical attempt to focus our attention on present concerns answers to the ontological observation that “we live in the present, so infinitely small. The rest either has been lived, or else it [the future] is uncertain” (Aurelius Med. VII, 54). It also reflects the observation that the pressing, immediate demands of one’s upsetting passions are all responses to concerns about the future (that some feared state will transpire, or some desired state may not) or to concerns about past actions (guilt, shame, or anxiety about how others have perceived one’s words or actions). Yet all that one can ever change or achieve is what is occurring in the present moment, which is the site of all decision, action, and freedom. It would follow that these pathe, or their immediate demands, are tangentially irrational. This is the thought that underlies both the Epicurean prayers of gratitude that nature has made necessary things easy to attain and difficult things easy to bear, and the Stoic teachings concerning the irrationality of the pathē. We must learn to calm our passions so we can clearly assess what is happening to us at any given moment, rectify our present intentions, and accept with equanimity all that is occurring which does not depend upon our volition. The larger aim is that the philosopher learns to separate the self (or in the Stoics, the ruling principle) from all unnecessary attachments to alienable, external goods, so that a sense of joy and gratitude can be experienced independent of whichever situations fate has delivered. As Hadot notes, the Epicurean and Stoic meditations concerning how death is nothing for “us” (since when it is here, “we” are not, and vice-versa) belong here: these meditations are a means to conquer worries about this inevitable future event (WAP 197-8). 

d. The View from Above

We saw in 4b how Hadot situates even Aristotle’s apparently purely theoretical endeavors in the context of a choice of bios, one which aims to deliver to the inquirer the great pleasure that attends even the study of physical nature, “for there is something wonderful in all of the works of Nature” (Aristotle at WAP 83). Similarly, Hadot notes, the Epicurean elaboration of a physical philosophy of atoms, an infinite universe, and a plurality of worlds was pursued and recommended by Epicurus as a means to overcome unnecessary fear of death and interventionist gods. The Stoics not only maintained the distinction Hadot generalizes to all ancient philosophy, between philosophy as a way of life and philosophical discourse. Hadot argues that thinkers in this school also maintained that there were “lived” practices of logic, involving the constant examination of one’s practical reasoning and forms of what he terms “practical physics” (WAP 172; PWL 242). Practical physics involved the philosopher’s activity of vigilantly monitoring all his beliefs concerning what he encounters. One practice here was that of dispassionately, analytically dividing enticing or threatening appearances into their matter, form, and parts. In this way, their potentially overpowering impression upon us is combated, as in Marcus’ famous description of sex as “the rubbing together of pieces of gut, followed by the spasmodic secretion of a little bit of slime” (PWL 185). Hadot devotes an entire essay in PWL to the practice of the “view from above,” which he argues was practiced across all of the ancient schools. In this exercise, the students are encouraged to reconsider how small, or ant-like, their lives and actions appear from an enlarged, or cosmic, perspective (the famous perspective sub specie eternis), so as to combat the erroneous significance our self-interest and passions prompt us to assign to particular episodes. In Cicero, as in Boethius (Consolations II 7), for example, the philosopher’s consideration of how his fate is as a tiny speck given the magnitude of the world or of space makes him see the irrationality of the pursuit of fame. Seneca recommends the same exercise to show the folly of pursuing luxuries and of nations’ constant warring (WAP 206-7). The positive side to the exercise is to again engender in students the kind of wonder, serenity, or elevation of spirit, imputed to the perspective of the Sage. In The Veil of Isis, Hadot’s late work on the history of Western conceptions of the natural world, Hadot aligns the attitude engendered by this view from above with the “Orphic” attitude to revealing nature’s secrets through poetry, art, and discourse (VI 155-32).  This attitude, pursued in modern philosophy under the rubric of aesthetic perception, is opposed to the “Promethean,” technological attempt to tame nature that is prominent in Baconian science.(VI 101-154).

e. Writing as Hypomnemata, and The Inner Citadel

Hadot’s treatment of Marcus Aurelius’ Ta Eis Eauton (or “Meditations”) in his long essay in PWL, and in the book The Inner Citadel, serves well to bring together both the methodological concerns governing Hadot’s readings of classical thought and this conception of ancient philosophy as revolving around a series of spiritual exercises. The text as we have it is divided into 473 fragments in twelve books, and for all its flashes of limpid beauty, it can seem completely disordered to the modern reader. It has provoked a host of interpretations over time, down to speculations concerning Marcus’ melancholia, stomach ulcer, or morphine addiction. The whole seems to develop no argument and often to repeat itself. The emperor-philosopher mixes genres, or language games, from aphorisms, via staged dialogues and injunctions addressed to himself, to citations from poets and other philosophers, to more extended enthymemes. For Hadot, these formal peculiarities of Marcus’ text dissolve when we situate the text itself as the exemplar of a type of spiritual exercise recommended in the Stoic heritage to which Marcus belonged: namely, as a hypomnemata the philosopher was enjoined to keep always at hand (procheiron), whose production and rereading was recommended as a means for to keep alive at all times the key Stoic principles (kephalaia), independent of whether anyone else should read them. In this perspective, as Hadot concludes The Inner Citadel, the repetitions, the multiple developments of the same theme, and the stylistic effort in the Meditations attest not to any conceptual laziness or other morbidity, rather they suggest “the efforts of a man . . . trying to do what, in the last analysis, we are all trying to do: to live in complete consciousness and lucidity, to give to each of our instants its full intensity, and to give meaning to our entire life” (IC, 312-313).

6. The Transformation of Philosophy after the Decline of Antiquity

a. The Adoption of Spiritual Practices in Monasticism

Hadot disputes the notion of a simple, radical break between Greek philosophy and Judeo-Christian monotheism. Hadot notes that, in the first centuries of the Christian era, educated Christian apologists such as Clement of Alexander, Basil of Caesarea, Origen, Justin, and the other Cappadocian fathers identified Christianity as the true, non-Greek, or “barbarian,” philosophia, much as Philo of Alexandria had presented Judaism as patrios philosophia—the traditional philosophy of the Jewish people (PWL 128-9). Here, Hadot’s attention to the creative role of exegetical errors in the history of ideas applies (see 2). For above all, the Greek word Logos was central to Greek philosophy since Heraclitus, but it was also used by Saint John in the opening verses of the fourth gospel, making possible this conception of Christianity as philosophy (WAP 218-9; PWL 128). Saint John maintained that anticipatory aspects or elements of the true Logos had been dispersed amongst the Greeks. Christians were in possession of the revealed Logos itself in the incarnate Christ. Christianity’s conception as a way of living also positioned it well to appropriate the spiritual exercises developed in the philosophical schools, integrating them into the different “style of life, spiritual attitude and tonality” of Christian life (PWL 129; 139). From the fourth century C. E., monasticism as the perfection of Christian life, in a life withdrawn from ordinary society and devoted to meditation and prayer, adopted what a Cistercian text calls “the disciplines of celestial philosophy” (PWL 129): prosoche or attention to oneself and one’s thoughts, askeseis of the passions, detachment or aprospatheia from worldly concerns, meditation upon key rules of life, the attempt to live each day as if it were one’s last, the practice of writing as hypomnema; all now refigured as the attempt to live in constant remembrance of god. (PWL 129-135)  Particularly interesting from a scholarly perspective are Hadot’s observations of the efforts made by Christian authors to ground these practices in biblical exegesis, as for instance in tying philosophical prosoche to biblical text: “Give heed to yourself, lest there be a hidden word in your heart” (Deuteronomy); Above all else, guard your heart” (Proverbs 4:23); “Examine yourself . . . and test yourselves” (Second Corinthians 13:5); and even the Song of Songs’ “If you do not know yourself, O most beautiful of women . . .” (WAP 248-9; 242; WAP 130).  

b. Philosophical Discourse as Handmaiden to Theology and the Natural Sciences

As Hadot notes, another component of the apologists’ attempt to present Christianity in forms congenial to Greco-Roman culture was the attempt to reinterpret elements of Greek philosophical discourse, for instance, the theological passages of the Timaeus, as anticipating revealed doctrine. In another way, the Christian authors would interpret revealed notions in terms redolent of philosophical discourse, as when Evagrius defines “the Kingdom of heaven” as “apatheia of the soul along with true knowledge of existing things” (PWL 136), or in Origen’s recommendation to students to read the Book of Proverbs, Ecclesiastes, and the Song of Songs, as corresponding respectively to philosophical ethics, physics, and theology (WAP 239-240). With the growing cultural ascendancy of revealed Christianity, however, particularly after the closure of the philosophical schools, Hadot argues that philosophy as a way of life was largely eclipsed. Philosophical discourse, for its part, was subordinated within the Christian orbit to the higher wisdom of the Word of God as revealed in the Bible. Elements of Aristotelian logic and ontology, as they had been integrated into the Neoplatonism of the imperial era, were adapted in the Church’s attempts to stabilize the Trinitarian God. Differently, Church fathers like Origen and Clement of Alexandria adopted Philo’s earlier claim that philosophical studies must be conceived as the propaedeutic to the wisdom revealed in the Torah of Moses. By the time of Augustine, philosophy was becoming assimilated in this way with the other secular, mathematical, and dialectical knowledge necessary for the Christian exegete—but in no way sufficient unto itself. The recovery of Aristotle’s writings in the West, and the development of the medieval universities, saw his dialectics adopted as a means for theologians to respond to problems Christian dogma posed to reason, whereas commentary on his dialectical, ethical, and physical writings became the keystone of teaching in the arts faculties. As Hadot comments, “Aristotle” in this way became “Aristotelianism,” and the conception of university philosophy as entirely an exegetical or “scholastic” endeavor was born. It would survive the rise of the natural sciences and the universities’ passing from the Church’s to the secular State’s authority.  According to Hadot, there remains a “radical opposition” between the modern, diploma-issuing university, which promotes specific levels of objectified, mostly written forms of knowledge or transferrable skills, and the ancient philosophical school, “which addressed individuals in order to transform their entire personality . . . to train people for their career as human beings . . .” (WAP 260).

c. The Permanence of the Ancient Conception of Philosophy

Nevertheless, Hadot argues that since the Middle Ages, philosophers both within and outside of the universities have kept alive what he terms the “vital, existential dimension” of ancient philosophy (WAP 261). Already in the Middle Ages, scholastic commentators noted the weight of passages in Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics (book X) as pointing toward the theoretical way of life as the culmination of philosophia.  Petrarch and Erasmus differently contested that philosophy could be reduced to the commentary on texts, since this in no way makes the scholar better. In a way which contrasts with Michel Foucault’s claims concerning the history of philosophy as a way of life, Hadot sees elements of Stoicism in Descartes’ conception of adequate or comprehensive representation, and his choice to write Meditations; also in Kant’s contrast of the “worldly” “Idea of Philosopher” from the “scholastic” “artists of reason,” and Kant’s central critical notion of the primacy of practical reason.  At different points in his oeuvre, Hadot also cites Montaigne, Shaftesbury, Rousseau, Goethe, Thoreau, Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Merleau-Ponty, and Wittgenstein as legatees to the ancient conception of philosophy as a way of life that it was his own life’s work to try to re-animate.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Works in French

  • Hadot, P, (with Henry, I.P.). (1960). Marius Victorinus, Traités théologiques sur la Trinité, Cerf 1960 (Sources Chrétiennes nos. 68 &69)
  • Porphyre et Victorinus. Paris, Institut d'Etudes augustiniennes, 1968. (Collection des études augustiniennes. Série antiquité; 32–33).
  • Marius Victorinus: recherches sur sa vie et ses oeuvres, 1971. (Collection des études augustiniennes. Série antiquité ; 44).
  • Exercices spirituels et philosophie antique. Paris, Etudes augustiniennes, 1981. (Collection des études augustiniennes. Série antiquité ; 88).
  • Hadot, Pierre. (1992). La citadelle intérieure. Introduction aux Pensées de Marc Aurèle. Paris: Fayard.
  • Hadot, Pierre. (1995). Qu'est-ce que la philosophie antique ? Paris: Gallimard. (Folio essais; 280).
  • Hadot, Pierre. (1997). Plotin ou la simplicité du regard (4e éd.) Paris: Gallimard. [1e éd. 1963]. (Folio esais; 302).
  • Etudes de philosophie ancienne. Paris, Les Belles Lettres, 1998. (L'âne d'or ; 8). (recueil d'articles)
  • Marc Aurèle. Ecrits pour lui même, texte établi et traduit par Pierre Hadot, avec la collaboration de Concetta Luna, vol. 1 (general introduction and Book 1). Paris, Collection Budé, 1998.
  • Plotin. Porphyre. Études néoplatoniciennes. Paris, Les Belles Lettres, 1999. (L'âne d'or ; 10). (recueil d'articles)
  • La philosophie comme manière de vivre. Paris, Albin Michel, 2002. (Itinéraires du savoir).
  • Exercices spirituels et philosophie antique, nouvelle éd. Paris, Albin Michel, 2002. (Bibliothèque de l'évolution de l'humanité).
  • Le voile d'Isis. Essai sur l'histoire de l'idée de nature. Paris, Gallimard, 2004. (NRF essais).
  • Wittgenstein et les limites du langage. Paris, J. Vrin, 2004. (Bibliothèque d'histoire de la philosophie).
  • Apprendre à philosopher dans l'antiquité. L'enseignement du Manuel d'Epictète et son commentaire néoplatonicien (avec Ilsetraut Hadot). Paris, LGF, 2004. (Le livre de poche; 603).

b. Works in English

  • Hadot, Pierre. (1993). Plotinus, Or the Simplicity of Vision. (Michael Chase, Trans.) Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Hadot, Pierre. (1995). Philosophy as a Way of Life. (Michael Chase, Trans.) Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Hadot, Pierre. (1998). The Inner Citadel; the Meditations of Marcus Aurelius. Harvard University Press.
  • Hadot, Pierre. (2002). What is Ancient Philosophy? (Michael Chase, Trans.) Harvard University Press.
  • Hadot, Pierre. (2006). The Veil of Isis. (Michael Chase, Trans.) Cambridge: Belknap Press.
  • Hadot, Pierre. (2005). There are Nowadays Professors of Philosophy, But Not Philosophers, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy 19.3, 229-237.
  • Conversations with Jeannie Carlier and Arnold I. Davidson, trans. Marc Djaballah (Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2009).

c. Selected Articles on Hadot

  • Chase, Michael. "Remembering Pierre Hadot", Parts 1 and 2, April 28, 2010, harvardpress.typepad.com/hup_publicity/2010/04/pierre-hadot-part-1.html.
  • Davidson, Arnold. (Spring 1990). Spiritual Exercises and Ancient Philosophy: An Introduction to Pierre Hadot. Critical Inquiry, 16, 475-482.
  • Davidson, Arnold.  (1995). Introduction: Pierre Hadot and the Spiritual Phenomenon of Ancient Philosophy, in Pierre Hadot, Philosophy as a Way of Life (Michael Chase, Trans.) Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Donato, Antonio. (2009, September). Review: Pierre Hadot, The Present Alone is Our Happiness: Conversations with Jeannie Carlier and Arnold I. Davidson. Foucault Studies, 7, 164-169.Flynn, Thomas. (2005, September). Philosophy as a Way of Life: Foucault and Hadot. Philosophy & Social Criticism, 31 (5-6), 609-622.
  • Force, Pierre. (2011, February). The Teeth of Time: Meaning and Misunderstanding in the History of Ideas. History and Theory, 50, 20-40.
  • Gregor, Bryan. (2011, January). The Text as Mirror: Kierkegaard and Hadot on Transformative Reading. History of Philosophy Quarterly, 28 (1).
  • Hankey, Wayne. (2003). Philosophy as Way of Life for Christians?: Iamblichan and Porphyrian Reflections on Religion, Virtue, and Philosophy in Thomas Aquinas. Laval théologique et philosophique, 59 (2), 193-224.
  • Lorenzi, Daniele. “La vie comme "réel" de la philosophie. Cavell, Foucault, Hadot et les techniques de l'ordinaire”, en La voix et la vertu. Variétés du perfectionnisme moral, PUF, Paris 2010, pp. 469-487.
  • Winkler, Albert Keith. (2002). “Review of Pierre Hadot, What is Ancient Philosophy?” Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 362 pp. xiv.
  • Zeyl, Donald. (2003). Review: Pierre Hadot, What is Ancient Philosophy? Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews.

 

Author Information

Matthew Sharpe
Email: matthew.sharpe@deakin.edu.au
Deakin University
Australia

Psychological Egoism

Psychological Egoism

Psychological egoism is the thesis that we are always deep down motivated by what we perceive to be in our own self-interest.  Psychological altruism, on the other hand, is the view that sometimes we can have ultimately altruistic motives.  Suppose, for example, that Pam saves Jim from a burning office building.  What ultimately motivated her to do this?  It would be odd to suggest that it’s ultimately her own benefit that Pam is seeking.  After all, she’s risking her own life in the process.  But the psychological egoist holds that Pam’s apparently altruistic act is ultimately motivated by the goal to benefit herself, whether she is aware of this or not.  Pam might have wanted to gain a good feeling from being a hero, or to avoid social reprimand that would follow had she not helped Jim, or something along these lines.

Several other egoistic views are related to, but distinct from psychological egoism. Unlike ethical egoism, psychological egoism is merely an empirical claim about what kinds of motives we have, not what they ought to be.  So, while the ethical egoist claims that being self-interested in this way is moral, the psychological egoist merely holds that this is how we are. Similarly, psychological egoism is not identical to what is often called “psychological hedonism.”  Psychological hedonism restricts the range of self-interested motivations to only pleasure and the avoidance of pain.  Thus, it is a specific version of psychological egoism.

The story of psychological egoism is rather peculiar.  Though it is often discussed, it hasn’t been explicitly held by many major figures in the history of philosophy. It is most often attributed to only Thomas Hobbes (1651) and Jeremy Bentham (1781).  Most philosophers explicitly reject the view, largely based on famous arguments from Joseph Butler (1726).  Nevertheless, psychological egoism can be seen as a background assumption of several other disciplines, such as psychology and economics.  Moreover, some biologists have suggested that the thesis can be supported or rejected directly based on evolutionary theory or work in sociobiology.

While psychological egoism is undoubtedly an empirical claim, there hasn’t always been a substantial body of experimental data that bears on the debate. However, a great deal of empirical work beginning in the late 20th century has largely filled the void. Evidence from biology, neuroscience, and psychology has stimulated a lively interdisciplinary dialogue. Regardless of whether or not the empirical evidence renders a decisive verdict on the debate, it has certainly enriched discussion of the issue.

Table of Contents

  1. Conceptual Framework for the Debate
    1. The Bare Theses
    2. Egoistic vs. Altruistic Desires
    3. Ultimate/Intrinsic Desires
    4. Relating Egoism and Altruism
  2. Philosophical Arguments For Egoism
    1. Desire-Satisfaction
    2. Simplicity and Parsimony
    3. Moral Education
    4. Self-Other Merging
  3. Philosophical Arguments Against Egoism
    1. Butler’s Stone: Presupposition & Byproducts
    2. Introspection and Common Sense
    3. Unfalsifiability
    4. The Paradox of Egoism
  4. Biology and Egoism
    1. Evolutionary vs. Psychological Altruism
    2. An Evolutionary Argument Against Egoism
  5. Cognitive Science and Egoism
    1. Behavioristic Learning Theory
    2. Neuroscience
    3. Social Psychology
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Conceptual Framework for the Debate

Psychological egoism is a thesis about motivation, usually with a focus on the motivation of human (intentional) action. It is exemplified in the kinds of descriptions we sometimes give of people’s actions in terms of hidden, ulterior motives. A famous story involving Abraham Lincoln usefully illustrates this (see Rachels 2003, p. 69). Lincoln was allegedly arguing that we are all ultimately self-interested when he suddenly stopped to save a group of piglets from drowning. His interlocutor seized the moment, attempting to point out that Lincoln is a living counter-example to his own theory; Lincoln seemed to be concerned with something other than what he took to be his own well-being. But Lincoln reportedly replied: “I should have had no peace of mind all day had I gone on and left that suffering old sow worrying over those pigs. I did it to get peace of mind, don’t you see?”

The psychological egoist holds that descriptions of our motivation, like Lincoln’s, apply to all of us in every instance. The story illustrates that there are many subtle moves for the defender of psychological egoism to make. So it is important to get a clear idea of the competing egoistic versus altruistic theories and of the terms of the debate between them.

a. The Bare Theses

Egoism is often contrasted with altruism. Although the egoism-altruism debate concerns the possibility of altruism in some sense, the ordinary term "altruism" may not track the issue that is of primary interest here.  In at least one ordinary use of the term, for someone to act altruistically depends on her being motivated solely by a concern for the welfare of another, without any ulterior motive to simply benefit herself.  Altruism here is a feature of the motivation that underlies the action (Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 199). (Another sense of "altruism"—often used in a fairly technical sense in biology—is merely behavioral; see §4a.) To this extent, this ordinary notion of altruism is close to what is of philosophical interest.  But there are differences.  For instance, ordinarily we seem to only apply the term “altruism” to fairly atypical actions, such as those of great self-sacrifice or heroism.  But the debate about psychological egoism concerns the motivations that underlie all of our actions (Nagel 1970/1978, p. 16, n. 1).

Regardless of ordinary terminology, the view philosophers label “psychological egoism” has certain key features. Developing a clear and precise account of the egoism-altruism debate is more difficult than it might seem at first. To make the task easier, we may begin with quite bare and schematic definitions of the positions in the debate (May 2011, p. 27; compare also Rosas 2002, p. 98): 

  • Psychological Egoism:  All of our ultimate desires are egoistic.
  • Psychological Altruism:  Some of our ultimate desires are altruistic.

We will use the term “desire” here in a rather broad sense to simply mean a motivational mental state—what we might ordinarily call a “motive” or “reason” in at least one sense of those terms. But what is an “ultimate” desire, and when is it “altruistic” rather than “egoistic”?  Answering these and related questions will provide the requisite framework for the debate.

b. Egoistic vs. Altruistic Desires

We can begin to add substance to our bare theses by characterizing what it is to have an altruistic versus an egoistic desire.  As some philosophers have pointed out, the psychological egoist claims that all of one’s ultimate desires concern oneself in some sense. However, we must make clear that an egoistic desire exclusively concerns one’s own well-being, benefit, or welfare. A malevolent ultimate desire for the destruction of an enemy does not concern oneself, but it is hardly altruistic (Feinberg 1965/1999, §9, p. 497; Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 229).

Similarly, despite its common use in this context, the term “selfish” is not appropriate here either. The psychological egoist claims that we ultimately only care about (what we consider to be) our own welfare, but this needn’t always amount to selfishness. Consider an ultimate desire to take a nap that is well-deserved and won’t negatively affect anyone. While this concerns one’s own benefit, there is no sense in which it is selfish (Henson 1988, §7; Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 227). The term “self-interest” is more fitting.

With these points in mind, we can characterize egoistic and altruistic desires in the following way:

  • One’s desire is egoistic if (and only if) it concerns (what one perceives to be) the benefit of oneself and not anyone else.
  • One’s desire is altruistic if (and only if) it concerns (what one perceives to be) the benefit of at least someone other than oneself.

It’s important that the desire in some sense represents the person as oneself (or, as the case may be, as another). For example, suppose that John wants to help put out a fire in the hair of a man who appears to be in front of him, but he doesn’t know that he’s actually looking into a mirror, and it’s his own hair that’s ablaze.  If John’s desire is ultimate and is simply to help the man with his hair in flames, then it is necessary to count his desire as concerning someone other than himself, even though he is in fact the man with his hair on fire (Oldenquist 1980, pp. 27-8; Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 214).

c. Ultimate/Intrinsic Desires

The reason for the focus on ultimate desires is that psychological egoists don’t deny that we often have desires that are altruistic. They do claim, however, that all such altruistic desires ultimately depend on an egoistic desire that is more basic. In other words, we have an ulterior motive when we help others—one that likely tends to fly below the radar of consciousness or introspection.

Thus, we must draw a common philosophical distinction between desires that are for a means to an end and desires for an end in itself.  Instrumental desires are those desires one has for something as a means for something else; ultimate desires are those desires one has for something as an end in itself, not as a means to something else (see Sober & Wilson 1998, pp. 217-222).  The former are often called “extrinsic desires” and the latter “intrinsic desires” (see e.g. Mele 2003 Ch. 1.8.).  Desires for pleasure and the avoidance of pain are paradigmatic ultimate desires, since people often desire these as ends in themselves, not as a mere means to anything else.  But the class of ultimate desires may include much more than this.

d. Relating Egoism and Altruism

There are two important aspects to highlight regarding how psychological egoism and altruism relate to one another. First, psychological egoism makes a stronger, universal claim that all of our ultimate desires are egoistic, while psychological altruism merely makes the weaker claim that some of our ultimate desires are altruistic.  Thus, the former is a monistic thesis, while the latter is a pluralistic thesis (Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 228).  Consequently, psychological egoism is easier to refute than the opposing view.  If one were to successfully demonstrate that some—even just one—of a person’s ultimate desires are altruistic, then we can safely reject psychological egoism.  For example, if Thomas removes his heel from another’s gouty toe because he has an ultimate desire that the person benefit from it, then psychological egoism is false.

Second, the positions in the debate are not exactly the denial of one another, provided there are desires that are neither altruistic nor egoistic (Stich, Doris, & Roedder 2010, sect. 2).  To take an example from Bernard Williams, a “madman” might have an ultimate desire for “a chimpanzees’ tea party to be held in the cathedral” (1973, p. 263). He does not desire this as a means to some other end, such as enjoyment at the sight of such a spectacle (he might, for example, secure this in his will for after his death).  Assuming the desire for such a tea party is neither altruistic nor egoistic (because it doesn’t have to do with anyone’s well-being), would it settle the egoism-altruism debate? Not entirely. It would show that psychological egoism is false, since it would demonstrate that some of our ultimate desires are not egoistic. However, it would not show that psychological altruism is true, since it does not show that some of our ultimate desires are altruistic.  Likewise, suppose that psychological altruism is false because none of our ultimate desires concern the benefit of others.  If that is true, psychological egoism is not thereby true.  It too could be false if we sometimes have ultimate desires that are not egoistic, like the madman’s.  The point is that the theses are contraries: they cannot both be true, but they can both be false.

2. Philosophical Arguments For Egoism

Philosophers don’t have much sympathy for psychological egoism.  Indeed, the only major figures in the history of philosophy to endorse the view explicitly are arguably Thomas Hobbes and Jeremy Bentham.  Some might also include Aristotle (compare Feinberg 1965/1999, p. 501) and John Stuart Mill (compare Sidgwick 1874/1907, 1.4.2.1), but there is some room for interpreting them otherwise. Hobbes explicitly states in Leviathan (1651/1991):

…no man giveth but with intention of good to himself, because gift is voluntary; and of all voluntary acts, the object is to every man his own good; of which, if men see they shall be frustrated, there will be no beginning of benevolence or trust, nor consequently of mutual help. (Ch. XV, p. 47)

In a similar vein, Bentham famously opens his Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation (1781/1991) with this:

Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do, as well as to determine what we shall do. On the one hand the standard of right and wrong, on the other the chain of causes and effects, are fastened to their throne. (p. 313)

Here Bentham appears to endorse a specific version of psychological egoism, namely psychological hedonism. This view restricts the kind of self-interest we can ultimately desire to pleasure or the avoidance of pain.  Unfortunately, Hobbes and Bentham don’t offer much in the way of arguments for these views; they tend to just assume them.

a. Desire-Satisfaction

One tempting argument for psychological egoism is based on what seem to be conceptual truths about (intentional) action.  For example, many hold that all of one’s actions are motivated by one’s own desires.  This might seem to directly support psychological egoism because it shows that we are all out to satisfy our own desires (compare Hobbes).  In his famous Fifteen Sermons, Bishop Butler (1726/1991) anticipates such an argument for the universality of egoistic desires (or “self-love”) in the following manner:

[B]ecause every particular affection is a man’s own, and the pleasure arising from its gratification his own pleasure, or pleasure to himself, such particular affection must be called self-love; according to this way of speaking, no creature whatever can possibly act but merely from self-love. (Sermon XI, p. 366)

However, as Butler goes on to say, this line of argument rests on a mistake or at least a play on words.  Many philosophers have subsequently reinforced Butler’s objection, often pointing to two intertwined confusions: one based on our desires being ours, another based on equivocation on the word “satisfaction.” On the former confusion, C. D. Broad says “it is true that all impulses belong to a self” but  “it is not true that the object of any of them is the general happiness of the self who owns them” (1930/2000, p. 65).

Similarly, the second confusion fails to distinguish between what Bernard Williams calls “desiring the satisfaction of one’s desire” and “desiring one’s own satisfaction” (1973, p. 261).  The word “satisfaction” in the latter case is the more ordinary use involving one’s own pleasure or happiness.  If all actions are motivated by a desire for this, then psychological egoism is indeed established. But the basic consideration from the theory of action we began with was merely that all actions are motivated by a desire of one’s own, which is meant to be satisfied.  However, this employs a different notion of satisfaction, which merely means that the person got what she wanted (Feinberg 1965/1999, p. 496).  The claim that everyone is out to satisfy their own desires is a fairly uninteresting one, since it doesn’t show that we are motivated by self-interest.  If Mother Teresa did have an altruistic desire for the benefit of another, it is no count against her that she sought to satisfy it—that is, bring about the benefit of another. This argument for psychological egoism, then, seems to rely on an obviously false view of self-interest as desire-satisfaction.

b. Simplicity and Parsimony

A major theoretical attraction of psychological egoism is parsimony.  It provides a simple account of human motivation and offers a unified explanation of all our actions. Although actions may vary in content, the ultimate source is self-interest: doing well at one’s job is merely to gain the favor of one’s boss; returning a wallet is merely to avoid the pang of guilt that would follow keeping it; saying “thank you” for a meal is merely to avoid social reprimand for failing to conform to etiquette; and so on.

One might dispute whether psychological egoism is any more parsimonious than psychological altruism (Sober & Wilson 1998, pp. 292-3).  More importantly, however, it is no argument for a view that it is simpler than its competitors. Perhaps we might employ Ockham’s Razor as a sort of tie-breaker to adjudicate between two theories when they are equal in all other respects, but this involves more than just simplicity (Sober & Wilson 1998, pp. 293-5).  As David Hume puts it, psychological egoism shouldn’t be based solely on “that love of simplicity which has been the source of much false reasoning in philosophy” (1751/1998, p. 166). The heart of the debate then is whether there are other reasons to prefer one view over the other.

c. Moral Education

Perhaps the psychological egoist needn’t appeal to parsimony or erroneous conceptions of self-interest. Bentham, after all, suggests that ordinary experience shows that we are ultimately motivated to gain pleasure or avoid pain (1781/1991, Ch. 3). Perhaps one could extrapolate an argument on behalf of psychological egoism along the following lines (Feinberg 1965/1999, sect. 4, p. 495). Experience shows that people must be taught to care for others with carrots and sticks—with reward and punishment. So seemingly altruistic ultimate desires are merely instrumental to egoistic ones; we come to believe that we must be concerned with the interests of others in order to gain rewards and avoid punishment for ourselves (compare the argument in §5a).

This line of reasoning is rather difficult to evaluate given that it rests on an empirical claim about moral development and learning.  Ordinary experience does show that sometimes it’s necessary to impose sanctions on children for them to be nice and caring. But even if this occurs often, it doesn't support a universal claim that it always does. Moreover, there is a growing body of evidence gathered by developmental psychologists indicating that young children have a natural, unlearned concern for others. There is some evidence, for example, that children as young as 14-months will spontaneously help a person they believe is in need (Warneken & Tomasello 2007).  It seems implausible that children have learned at such a young age that this behavior will be benefit themselves. On the other hand, such empirical results do not necessarily show that the ultimate motivation behind such action is altruistic. The psychological egoist could argue that we still possess ultimately egoistic desires (perhaps we are simply born believing that concern for others will benefit oneself).  However, the developmental evidence still undermines the moral education argument by indicating that our concern for the welfare others is not universally learned from birth by sanctions of reward and punishment.

d. Self-Other Merging

Another argument for psychological egoism relies on the idea that we often blur our conception of ourselves and others when we are benevolent. Consider the paradigm of apparently selfless motivation: concern for family, especially one’s children. Francis Hutcheson anticipates the objection when he imagines a psychological egoist proclaiming: “Children are not only made of our bodies, but resemble us in body and mind; they are rational agents as we are, and we only love our own likeness in them” (1725/1991, p. 279, Raphael sect. 327). And this might seem to be supported by recent empirical research. After all, social psychologists have discovered that we tend to feel more empathy for others we perceive to be in need when they are similar to us in various respects and when we take on their perspective (Batson 1991; see §5b). In fact, some psychologists have endorsed precisely this sort of self-other merging argument for an egoistic view (for example, Cialdini, Brown, Lewis, Luce, and Neuberg 1997).

One might doubt, however, whether a self-other merging account is able to explain helping behavior in an egoistic way. For example, it would be quite implausible to say that we literally believe we exist in two different bodies when feeling empathy for someone. The most credible reading of the proposal is that we conceptually blur the distinction between ourselves and others in the relevant cases. Yet this would seem to require, contrary to fact, that our behavior reflects this blurring. If we think of the boundary between ourselves and another as indeterminate, presumably our helping behavior would reflect such indeterminacy. (For further discussion, see Hutcheson 1725/1991, pp. 279-80; Batson 2011, ch. 6; May 2011.)

3. Philosophical Arguments Against Egoism

Considering the arguments, the case for psychological egoism seems rather weak. But is there anything to be said directly against it? This section examines some of the most famous arguments philosophers have proposed against the view.

a. Butler’s Stone: Presupposition & Byproducts

Bishop Joseph Butler provides a famous argument against psychological egoism (focusing on hedonism) in his Fifteen Sermons.  The key passage is the following:

That all particular appetites and passions are towards external things themselves, distinct from the pleasure arising from them, is manifested from hence; that there could not be this pleasure, were it not for that prior suitableness between the object and the passion: there could be no enjoyment or delight from one thing more than another, from eating food more than from swallowing a stone, if there were not an affection or appetite to one thing more than another. (1726/1991, Sermon XI, p. 365)

Many philosophers have championed  this argument, which Elliott Sober and David Sloan Wilson (1998) have dubbed “Butler’s stone.” Broad (1930/2000), for example, writes that Butler “killed the theory [of psychological egoism] so thoroughly that he sometimes seems to the modern reader to be flogging dead horses” (p. 55).

Butler’s idea is that the experience of pleasure upon attaining something presupposes (or at least strongly indicates) a desire for the thing attained, not the pleasure itself. After all, we typically do not experience pleasure upon getting something (like food) unless we want it. The pleasure that accompanies the fulfillment of our desires is often a mere byproduct of our prior desire for the thing that gave us pleasure. Often we feel pleasure upon getting what we want precisely because we wanted what gave us pleasure. Consider, for example, getting second place in a race. This would make a runner happy if she wants to get second place; but it would not if she doesn't want this at all (e.g. she only wants first place).

While Butler's version of the argument may be overly ambitious in various respects (Sidgwick 1874/1907, 1.4.2.3; Sober and Wilson 1998, p. 278), the best version is probably something like the following (compare the "disinterested benevolence" argument in Feinberg 1965/1999, §c8):

  1. Sometimes people benefit from helping others (e.g. experience pleasure).
  2. Sometimes such benefit presupposes a desire for what generated it (e.g. food), not for the resulting benefit.
  3. So sometimes people desire things other than self-interest.
  4. Therefore: Psychological egoism is false.

The basic idea is that pleasure (or self-interest generally) can’t be our universal concern because having it sometimes presupposes a desire for something other than pleasure itself. Many philosophers have endorsed this sort of argument, not only against hedonism but more generally against egoism (Hume 1751/1998, App. 2.12; Broad 1950/1952; Nagel 1970/1978, p. 80, n. 1; Feinberg 1965/1999).

Sober and Wilson, however, make the case that such arguments are seriously flawed at least because “the conclusion does not follow from the premises” (1998, p. 278). That is, the premises, even if true, fail to establish the conclusion. The main problem is that such arguments tell us nothing about which desires are ultimate. Even if the experience of pleasure sometimes presupposes a desire for the pleasurable object, it is still left open whether the desire for what generated the pleasure is merely instrumental to a desire for pleasure (or some other form of self-interest). Consider the following causal chain, using “→” to mean “caused” (see Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 278):

Desire for food → Eating → Pleasure

According to Butler, the experience of pleasure upon eating some food allows us to infer the existence of a desire for food. This is all the argument gets us. Yet Butler's opponent, the egoist, maintains that the desire for food is subsequent to and dependent on an ultimate desire for pleasure (or some other form of self-interest):

Ultimate desire for pleasure → Desire for food → Eating → Pleasure

This egoistic picture is entirely compatible with Butler's claims about presupposition. So, even if the premises are true, it does not follow that egoism is false.

Butler would need a stronger premise, such as: pleasure presupposes an ultimate desire for what generated it, not for the resulting benefit. But this revision would plausibly make the argument question-begging. The new premise seems to amount to nothing more than the denial of psychological egoism: sometimes people have an ultimate desire for something other than self-interest. At the very least, the argument is dialectically unhelpful—it offers premises in support of the conclusion that are as controversial as the conclusion is, and for similar reasons.

Still, a general lesson can clearly be gained from arguments like Butler's. Psychological egoists cannot establish their view simply by pointing to the pleasure or self-benefit that accompanies so many actions. After all, often self-benefit only seems to be what we ultimately desire, though a closer look reveals benefits like pleasure are likely just byproducts while the proximate desire is for that which generates them. As Hume puts it, sometimes "we are impelled immediately to seek particular objects, such as fame or power, or vengeance without any regard to interest; and when these objects are attained a pleasing enjoyment ensues, as the consequence of our indulged affections" (1751/1998, App. 2.12, emphasis added). Perhaps Butler's point is best seen as a formidable objection to a certain kind of argument for egoism, rather than a positive argument against the theory.

b. Introspection and Common Sense

A simple argument against psychological egoism is that it seems obviously false.  As Francis Hutcheson proclaims: “An honest farmer will tell you, that he studies the preservation and happiness of his children, and loves them without any design of good to himself” (1725/1991, p. 277, Raphael sect. 327). Likewise, Hume rhetorically asks, “What interest can a fond mother have in view, who loses her health by assiduous attendance on her sick child, and afterwards languishes and dies of grief, when freed, by its death, from the slavery of that attendance?” (1751/1998, App. 2.9, p. 167).  Building on this observation, Hume takes the “most obvious objection” to psychological egoism to be that:

…as it is contrary to common feeling and our most unprejudiced notions, there is required the highest stretch of philosophy to establish so extraordinary a paradox. To the most careless observer there appear to be such dispositions as benevolence and generosity; such affections as love, friendship, compassion, gratitude. […] And as this is the obvious appearance of things, it must be admitted, till some hypothesis be discovered, which by penetrating deeper into human nature, may prove the former affections to be nothing but modifications of the latter. (1751/1998, App. 2.6, p. 166)

Here Hume is offering a burden-shifting argument.  The idea is that psychological egoism is implausible on its face, offering strained accounts of apparently altruistic actions. So the burden of proof is on the egoist to show us why we should believe the view; yet the attempts so far have “hitherto proved fruitless,” according to Hume (1751/1998, App. 2.6, p. 166). Similarly, C. D. Broad (1950/1952) and Bernard Williams (1973, pp. 262-3) consider various examples of actions that seem implausible to characterize as ultimately motivated by self-interest.

Given the arguments, it is still unclear why we should consider psychological egoism to be obviously untrue.  One might appeal to introspection or common sense; but neither is particularly powerful.  First, the consensus among psychologists is that a great number of our mental states, even our motives, are not accessible to consciousness or cannot reliably be reported on through the use of introspection (see, for example, Nisbett and Wilson 1977). While introspection, to some extent, may be a decent source of knowledge of our own minds, it is fairly suspect to reject an empirical claim about potentially unconscious motivations.  Besides, one might report universally egoistic motives based on introspection (e.g. Mercer 2001, pp. 229-30).  Second, shifting the burden of proof based on common sense is rather limited. Sober and Wilson (1998, p. 288) go so far as to say that we have “no business taking common sense at face value” in the context of an empirical hypothesis. Even if we disagree with their claim and allow a larger role for shifting burdens of proof via common sense, it still may have limited use, especially when the common sense view might be reasonably cast as supporting either position in the egoism-altruism debate.  Here, instead of appeals to common sense, it would be of greater use to employ more secure philosophical arguments and rigorous empirical evidence.

c. Unfalsifiability

Another popular complaint about psychological egoism is that it seems to be immune to empirical refutation; it is “unfalsifiable.” And this is often taken to be a criterion for an empirical theory: any view that isn’t falsifiable isn’t a genuine, credible scientific theory (see Karl Popper’s Falsificationism). The worry for psychological egoism is that it will fail to meet this criterion if any commonly accepted altruistic action can be explained away as motivated by some sort of self-interest. Joel Feinberg, for example, writes:

Until we know what they [psychological egoists] would count as unselfish behavior, we can’t very well know what they mean when they say that all voluntary behavior is selfish. And at this point we may suspect that they are holding their theory in a “privileged position”—that of immunity to evidence, that they would allow no conceivable behavior to count as evidence against it. What they say then, if true, must be true in virtue of the way they define—or redefine—the word “selfish.” And in that case, it cannot be an empirical hypothesis. (1965/1999, §18, p. 503; see also §§14-19)

As we have seen (§1b), psychological egoism needn’t hold that all our ultimate desires are selfish. But Feinberg’s point is that we need to know what would count as empirical evidence against the existence of an egoistic ultimate desire.

This objection to psychological egoism has three substantial problems. First, falsification criteria for empirical theories are problematic and have come under heavy attack. In addition it’s unclear why we should think the view is false. Perhaps it is a bad scientific theory or a view we shouldn’t care much about, but it is not thereby false. Second, any problems that afflict psychological egoism on this front will also apply to the opposing view (Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 290). After all, psychological altruism is a pluralistic thesis that includes both egoistic and altruistic motives. Third, and most importantly, a charitable construal of psychological egoism renders it falsifiable. As we have seen, psychological egoists have a clear account of what would falsify it: an ultimate desire that is not egoistic. While it may be difficult to detect the ultimate motives of people, the view is in principle falsifiable. In fact, it is empirically testable, as we shall see below.

d. The Paradox of Egoism

Another popular objection to various forms of psychological egoism is often called “the paradox of hedonism,” which was primarily popularized by Henry Sidgwick (1874/1907, 2.3.2.3). It is usually directed at psychological hedonism, but the problem can be extended to psychological egoism generally.

When the target is only hedonism, the “paradox” is that we tend to attain more pleasure by focusing on things other than pleasure.  Likewise, when directed at egoism generally, the idea is that we will tend not to benefit ourselves by focusing on our own benefit. Consider someone, Jones, who is ultimately concerned with his own well-being, not the interests of others (the example is adapted from Feinberg 1965/1999, p. 498, sect. 11).  Two things will seemingly hold: (a) such a person would eventually lack friends, close relationships, etc. and (b) this will lead to much unhappiness. This seems problematic for a theory that says all of our ultimate desires are for our own well-being.

Despite its popularity, this sort of objection to psychological egoism is quite questionable. There are several worries about the premises of the argument, such as the claim that ultimate concern for oneself diminishes one’s own well-being (see Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 280).  Most importantly, the paradox is only potentially an issue for a version of egoism that prescribes ultimate concern for oneself, such as normative egoism (Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 280). The futility of ultimate concern for oneself can only undermine claims such as “We should only ultimately care about our own well-being” since this allegedly would not lead to happiness. But psychological egoism is a descriptive thesis. Even if egoistic ultimate desires lead to unhappiness, that would only show that egoistically motivated people will find this unfortunate.

4. Biology and Egoism

Despite its widespread rejection among philosophers, philosophical arguments against psychological egoism aren’t overwhelmingly powerful. However, the theses in this debate are ultimately empirical claims about human motivation.  So we can also look to more empirical disciplines, such as biology and psychology, to advance the debate. Biology in particular contains an abundance of literature on altruism. But, as we will see, much of it is rather tangential to the thesis of psychological altruism.

a. Evolutionary vs. Psychological Altruism

The ordinary (psychological) sense of “altruism” is different from altruism as discussed in biology.  For example, sociobiologists, such as E. O. Wilson, often theorize about the biological basis of altruism by focusing on the behavior of non-human animals. But this is altruism only in the sense of helpful behavior that seems to be at some cost to the helper.  It says nothing about the motivations for such behavior, which is of interest to us here. Similarly, “altruism” is a label commonly used in a technical sense as a problem for evolutionary theory (see Altruism and Group Selection).  What we might separately label evolutionary altruism occurs whenever an organism “reduces its own fitness and augments the fitness of others” regardless of the motivation behind it (Sober & Wilson 1998, p. 199). Distinguishing the psychological sense of “altruism” from other uses of the term is crucial if we are to look to biology to contribute to the debate on ultimate desires.

Given the multiple uses of terms, discussion of altruism and self-interest in evolutionary theory can often seem directly relevant to the psychological egoism-altruism debate.  One might think, for example, that basic facts about evolution show we’re motivated by self-interest. Consider our desire for water. We have this perhaps solely because it enhanced the evolutionary “fitness” of our ancestors, by helping them stay alive and thus to propagate their genes. And evolutionary theory plausibly uncovers this sort of gene-centered story for many features of organisms. Richard Dawkins offers us some ideas of this sort. Although he emphasizes that the term “selfish,” as he applies it to genes, is merely metaphorical, he says “we have the power to defy the selfish genes of our birth… let us try to teach generosity and altruism because we are born selfish (1976/2006, p. 3).

But we should be careful not to let the self-centered origin of our traits overshadow the traits themselves. Even if all of our desires are due to evolutionary adaptations (which is a strong claim), this is only the origin of them. Consider again the desire for water. It might exist only because it can help propagate one’s genes, but the desire is still for water, not to propagate one’s genes (compare the Genetic Fallacy). As Simon Blackburn points out, “Dawkins is following a long tradition in implying that biology carries simple messages for understanding the sociology and psychology of human beings” (1998, p. 146).  To be fair, in a later edition of The Selfish Gene, Dawkins recognizes his folly and asks the reader to ignore such “rogue” sentences (p. ix).  In any event, we must avoid what Blackburn polemically calls the “biologist’s fallacy” of “inferring the ‘true’ psychology of the person from the fact that his or her genes have proved good at replicating over time” (p. 147).  The point is that we must avoid simple leaps from biology to psychology without substantial argument (see also Stich et al. 2010, sect. 3).

b. An Evolutionary Argument Against Egoism

Philosopher Elliott Sober and biologist David Sloan Wilson (1998) have made careful and sophisticated arguments for the falsity of psychological egoism directly from considerations in evolutionary biology. Their contention is the following: “‘Natural selection is unlikely to have given us purely egoistic motives” (p. 12).  To establish this, they focus on parental care, an other-regarding behavior in humans, whose mechanism is plausibly due to natural selection. Assuming such behavior is mediated by what the organism believes and desires, we can inquire into the kinds of mental mechanisms that could have evolved. The crucial question becomes: Is it more likely that such a mechanism for parental care would, as psychological egoism holds, involve only egoistic ultimate desires?  To answer this question, Sober and Wilson focus on just one version of egoism, and what they take to be the most difficult to refute: psychological hedonism (p. 297). The hedonistic mechanism always begins with the ultimate desire for pleasure and the avoidance of pain. The mechanism consistent with psychological altruism, however, is pluralistic: some ultimate desires are hedonistic, but others are altruistic.

According to Sober and Wilson, there are three main factors that could affect the likelihood that a mechanism evolved: availability, reliability, and energetic efficiency (pp. 305-8). First, the genes that give rise to the mechanism must be available in the pool for selection. Second, the mechanism mustn’t conflict with the organism’s reproductive fitness; they must reliably produce the relevant fitness-enhancing outcome (such as viability of offspring).  And third, they must do this efficiently, without yielding a significant cost to the organism’s own fitness-enhancing resources. Sober and Wilson find no reason to believe that a hedonistic mechanism would be more or less available or energetically efficient. The key difference, they contend, is reliability: “Pluralism was just as available as hedonism, it was more reliable, and hedonism provides no advantage in terms of energetic efficiency” (p. 323).

Sober and Wilson make several arguments for the claim that the pluralistic mechanism is more reliable. But one key disadvantage of a hedonistic mechanism, they argue, is that it’s heavily “mediated by beliefs” (p. 314). For example, in order to produce parental care given the ultimate desire for pleasure, one must believe that helping one’s child will provide one with sufficient pleasure over competing alternative courses of action:

(Ultimate) Desire for Pleasure → Believe Helping Provides Most Pleasure → Desire to Help

Moreover, such beliefs must be true, otherwise it's likely the instrumental desire to help will eventually extinguish, and then the fitness-enhancing outcome of parental care won’t occur. The pluralistic model, however, is comparatively less complicated since it can just deploy an ultimate desire to help:

(Ultimate) Desire to Help

Since the pluralistic mechanism doesn’t rely on as many beliefs, it is less susceptible to lack of available evidence for maintaining them. So yielding the fitness-enhancing outcome of parental care will be less vulnerable to disruption. Sober and Wilson (p. 314) liken the hedonistic mechanism to a Rube Goldberg machine, partly because it accomplishes its goal through overly complex means. Each link in the chain is susceptible to error, which makes the mechanism less reliable at yielding the relevant outcome.

Such arguments have not gone undisputed (see, for example, Stich et al. 2010, sect. 3). Yet they still provide a sophisticated way to connect evolutionary considerations with psychological egoism.  In the next section we’ll consider more direct ways for addressing the egoism-altruism debate empirically.

5. Cognitive Science and Egoism

Psychological egoism is an empirical claim; however, considerations from biology provide only one route to addressing the egoism-altruism debate empirically. Another, perhaps more direct, approach is to examine empirical work on the mind itself.

a. Behavioristic Learning Theory

In the 20th century, one of the earliest philosophical discussions of egoism as it relates to research in psychology comes from Michael Slote (1964). He argues that there is at least potentially a basis for psychological egoism in behavioristic theories of learning, championed especially by psychologists such as B. F. Skinner. Slote writes that such theories “posit a certain number of basically ‘selfish,’ unlearned primary drives or motives (like hunger, thirst, sleep, elimination, and sex), and explain all other, higher-order drives or motives as derived genetically from the primary ones via certain ‘laws of reinforcement’” (p. 530). This theory importantly makes the additional claim that the “higher-order” motives, including altruistic ones, are not “functionally autonomous.” That is, they are merely instrumental to (“functionally dependent” on) the egoistic ultimate desires. According to Slote, the basic support for functional dependence is the following: If “we cut off all reinforcement of [the instrumental desire] by primary rewards (rewards of primary [egoistic] drives),” then the altruistic desire “actually does extinguish” (p. 531). Thus, all altruistic desires are merely instrumental to ultimately egoistic ones; we have merely learned through conditioning that benefiting others benefits ourselves. That, according to Slote, is what the behavioristic learning theory maintains.

Like the moral education argument, Slote's is vulnerable to work in developmental psychology indicating that some prosocial behavior is not conditioned (see §2c). Moreover, behavioristic approaches throughout psychology have been widely rejected in the wake of the “cognitive revolution.” Learning theorists now recognize mechanisms that go quite beyond the tools of behaviorism (beyond mere classical and operant conditioning).  Slote does only claim to have established the following highly qualified thesis: “It would seem, then, that, as psychology stands today, there is at least some reason to think that the psychological theory we have been discussing may be true” (p. 537); and he appears to reject psychological egoism in his later work. In any event, more recent empirical research is more apt and informative to this debate.

b. Neuroscience

Philosopher Carolyn Morillo (1990) has defended a version of psychological hedonism based on more recent neuroscientific work primarily done on rats.  Morillo argues for a “strongly monistic” theory of motivation that is grounded in “internal reward events,” which holds that “we [ultimately] desire these reward events because we find them to be intrinsically satisfying” (p. 173).  The support for her claim is primarily evidence that the “reward center” of the brain, which is the spring of motivation, is the same as the “pleasure center,” which indicates that the basic reward driving action is pleasure.

Morillo admits though that the idea is "highly speculative" and based on "empirical straws in the wind." Furthermore, philosopher Timothy Schroeder (2004) argues that later work in neuroscience casts serious doubt on the identification of the reward event with pleasure. In short, by manipulating rats' brains, neuroscientist Kent Berridge and colleagues have provided substantial evidence that being motivated to get something is entirely separable from "liking" it (that is, from its generating pleasure). Against Morillo, Schroeder concludes that the data are better explained by the hypothesis that the reward center of the brain “can indirectly activate the pleasure center than by the hypothesis that either is such a center” (p. 81, emphasis added; see also Schroeder, Roskies, and Nichols 2010, pp. 105-6.)

c. Social Psychology

Other empirical work that bears on the existence of altruistic motives can be found in the study of empathy-induced helping behavior. Beginning around the 1980s, C. Daniel Batson and other social psychologists addressed the debate head on by examining such phenomena. Batson (1991; 2011), in particular, argues that the experiments conducted provide evidence for an altruistic model, the empathy-altruism hypothesis, which holds that as “empathic feeling for a person in need increases, altruistic motivation to have that person’s need relieved increases” (1991, p. 72). In other words, the hypothesis states that empathy tends to induce in us ultimate desires for the well-being of someone other than ourselves. If true, this entails that psychological egoism is false.

Batson comes to this conclusion by concentrating on a robust effect of empathy on helping behavior discovered in the 1970s. The empathy-helping relationship is the finding that the experience of relatively high empathy for another perceived to be in need causes people to help the other more than relatively low empathy. However, as Batson recognizes, this doesn’t establish psychological altruism, because it doesn’t specify whether the ultimate desire is altruistic or egoistic. Given that there can be both egoistic and altruistic explanations of the empathy-helping relationship, Batson and others have devised experiments to test them.

The general experimental approach involves placing ordinary people in situations in which they have an opportunity to help someone they think is in need while manipulating other variables in the situation.  The purpose is to provide circumstances in which egoistic versus altruistic explanations of empathy-induced helping behavior make different predictions about what people will do.  Different hypotheses then provide either egoistic or altruistic explanations of why the subjects ultimately chose to help or offer to help. (For detailed discussions of the background assumptions involved here, see Batson 1991, pp. 64-67; Sober & Wilson 1998, Ch. 6; Stich, Doris, and Roedder 2010.)

Several egoistic explanations of the empathy-helping relationship are in competition with the empathy-altruism hypothesis. Each one claims that experiences of relatively high empathy (“empathic arousal”) causes subjects to help simply because it induces an egoistic ultimate desire; the desire to help the other is solely instrumental to the ultimate desire to benefit oneself.  However, the experiments seem to rule out all the plausible (and some rather implausible) egoistic explanations.  For example, if those feeling higher amounts of empathy help only because they want to reduce the discomfort of the situation, then they should help less frequently when they know their task is over and they can simply leave the experiment without helping. Yet this prediction has been repeatedly disconfirmed (Batson 1991, ch. 8). A host of experiments have similarly disconfirmed a range of egoistic hypotheses. The cumulative results evidently show that the empathy-helping relationship is not put in place by egoistic ultimate desires to either:

  • relieve personal distress (e.g. discomfort from the situation),
  • avoid self-punishment (e.g. feelings of guilt),
  • avoid social-punishment (e.g. looking bad to others),
  • obtain rewards from self or others (e.g. praise, pride),
  • gain a mood-enhancing experience (e.g. feel glad someone was helped).

Furthermore, according to Batson, the data all conform to the empathy-altruism hypothesis, which claims that empathic arousal induces an ultimate desire for the person in need to be helped (see Batson 1991; for a relatively brief review, see Batson & Shaw 1991).

Some have argued against Batson that there are plausible egoistic explanations not ruled out by the data collected thus far (e.g. Cialdini et al. 1997; Sober & Wilson 1998, Ch. 8; Stich, Doris, and Roedder 2010). However, many egoistic explanations have been tested along similar lines and appear to be disconfirmed. While Batson admits that more studies can and should be done on this topic, he ultimately concludes that we are at least tentatively justified in believing that the empathy-altruism hypothesis is true. Thus, he contends that psychological egoism is false: "Contrary to the beliefs of Hobbes, La Rochefoucauld, Mandeville, and virtually all psychologists, altruistic concern for the welfare of others is within the human repertoire" (1991, p. 174).

6. Conclusion

It seems philosophical arguments against psychological egoism aren’t quite as powerful as we might expect given the widespread rejection of the theory among philosophers. So the theory is arguably more difficult to refute than many have tended to suppose. It is important to keep in mind, however, that the theory makes a rather strong, universal claim that all of our ultimate desires are egoistic, making it easy to cast doubt on such a view given that it takes only one counter-example to refute it.

Another important conclusion is that empirical work can contribute to the egoism-altruism debate. There is now a wealth of data emerging in various disciplines that addresses this fascinating and important debate about the nature of human motivation. While some have argued that the jury is still out, it is clear that the rising interdisciplinary dialogue is both welcome and constructive. Perhaps with the philosophical and empirical arguments taken together we can declare substantial progress.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Batson, C. D.  (1991). The Altruism Question: Toward a Social-Psychological Answer. Hillsdale, NJ:  Lawrence Erlbaum Associates.
    • Batson’s first book-length defense of the existence of altruism. Examines a wide range of empirical data from social psychology for the empathy-altruism hypothesis.
  • Batson, C. D. (2011). Altruism in Humans. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • An updated book-length defense of the existence of altruism in humans. Attempts to rebut challenges to the empathy-altruism hypothesis based on experiments done since the early 1990s.
  • Batson, C. D & L. L. Shaw (1991). “Evidence for Altruism: Toward a Pluralism of Prosocial Motives.”  Psychological Inquiry Vol. 2, No. 2, pp. 107–122.
    • An overview of the experimental evidence for altruism. Examines the experimental evidence for the empathy-altruism hypothesis more briefly than Batson’s book.
  • Bentham, Jeremy (1781/1991). Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation. Reprinted in part in Raphael (1991), Vol. II, pp. 313–346.
    • Bentham’s famous treatise defending utilitarianism. One of his basic assumptions about human psychology is psychological hedonism.
  • Blackburn, Simon (1998). Ruling Passions. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • A broadly Humean account of motivation and ethics that covers, among others things, some issues at the intersection of egoism and biology (see ch. 5).
  • Broad, C. D. (1930/2000). Five Types of Ethical Theory. Reprinted in 2000, London: Routledge. (Originally published in 1930 by Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co. Ltd.)
    • A discussion of the ethical theories of Spinoza, Butler, Hume, Kant, and Sidgwick. Broad champions Butler’s arguments against psychological egoism, saying Butler thoroughly “killed the theory.”
  • Broad, C. D. (1950/1952). “Egoism as a Theory of Human Motives.” The Hibbert Journal Vol. 48, pp. 105–114. (Reprinted in his Ethics and the History of Philosophy: Selected Essays, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1952.)
    • Broad’s famous discussion of psychological egoism in which he provides a rich framework for the debate. He develops what takes to be the most plausible version of psychological egoism, but concludes that it is rather implausible.
  • Butler, Joseph (1726/1991). Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel. Reprinted in part in Raphael (1991), Vol. I, pp. 325–377.  (Originally published by Hilliard and Brown in Cambridge; Hilliard, Gray, Little, and Wilkins in Boston.)
    • Butler’s famous text discussing, among other things, psychological egoism and hedonism, though not under those labels. He mounts a famous argument against psychological hedonism in particular.
  • Cialdini, Robert B., S. L. Brown, B. P. Lewis, C. Luce, & S. L. Neuberg (1997). “Reinterpreting the Empathy-Altruism Relationship: When One Into One Equals Oneness” Journal of Personality and Social Psychology 73 (3): 481-494.
    • A widely cited criticism of Batson's empathy-altruism hypothesis. The authors present empirical evidence that empathy tends to induce ultimately egoistic, not altruistic, motives by blurring one's distinction between oneself and the other for whom empathy is felt.
  • Dawkins, Richard (1976/2006). The Selfish Gene. 30th anniversary edition with new introduction, New York: Oxford University Press, 2006. (Originally published in 1976.)
    • Famous account of the process of evolution, turning the focus on genes, rather than the organism, and their propensity to replicate themselves via natural selection (hence the idea of a “selfish” gene).
  • Feinberg, Joel (1965/1999). “Psychological Egoism.” In Joel Feinberg & Russ Shafer-Landau (eds.), Reason and Responsibility, 10th ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 1999.  (Originally published in 1965 by Dickenson Pub. Co., based on materials composed for philosophy students at Brown University in 1958.)
    • A comprehensive discussion of philosophical arguments for and against psychological egoism. Rejects psychological egoism based primarily on traditional philosophical arguments.
  • Henson, Richard G. (1988). “Butler on Selfishness and Self-Love.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research Vol. 49, No. 1, pp. 31–57.
    • An examination of Butler’s arguments against psychological egoism as they relate to selfishness. Henson importantly argues that the “self-love” crucial to egoism is not equivalent to selfishness.
  • Hobbes, Thomas (1651/1991). Leviathan. Reprinted in part in Raphael (1991) Vol. I, pp. 18–60.
    • The classic treatise on moral and political philosophy grounded in what is often considered a grim view of human nature. A classic interpretation is that Hobbes holds a form of psychological egoism.
  • Hume, David (1751/1998). “Of Self-Love.” Appendix II of his An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, Tom L. Beauchamp (ed.), Oxford University Press.
    • A discussion of psychological egoism that is absent from the Treatise. Largely endorses Butler’s arguments against psychological egoism while offering some original considerations against it as well.
  • Hutcheson, Francis (1725/1991). An Inquiry into the Original of our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue. Reprinted in part in Raphael (1991), Vol. I, pp. 260–321.  (First printed in 1725.)
    • Argues against psychological egoism in a variety of ways, most notably by attempting to reveal how implausible it is on its face once its commitments are made clear. See especially Treatise II, An Inquiry Concerning the Original of Our Ideas of Virtue or Moral Good.
  • May, Joshua (2011). “Egoism, Empathy, and Self-Other Merging.” Southern Journal of Philosophy Vol. 49, Spindel Supplment: Empathy and Ethics, Remy Debes (ed.), pp. 25-39.
    • A critique of arguments for psychological egoism that appeal to the idea that we blur the distinction between ourselves and others, especially when we feel empathy for them.
  • Mele, Alfred (2003). Motivation and Agency. New York:  Oxford University Press.
    • Discusses a wide range of philosophical topics related to motivation. Although egoism isn’t covered, ch. 1 provides a rich conceptual framework for discussing motivation in a broad range of contexts, such as a taxonomy of various desires.
  • Mercer, Mark. (2001). “In Defence of Weak Psychological Egoism.” Erkenntnis Vol. 55, No. 2, pp. 217–237.
    • A recent defense of a form of psychological egoism that appeals to introspection and the purported unintelligibility of altruistic explanations of actions.
  • Morillo, Carolyn (1990). “The Reward Event and Motivation.” The Journal of Philosophy Vol. 87, No. 4, pp. 169–186.
    • A recent defense of a kind of psychological hedonism based on work in neuroscience, especially experiments on rats and their “pleasure centers.”
  • Nagel, Thomas (1970/1978). The Possibility of Altruism. Princeton University Press. (Originally published in 1970, Oxford: Clarendon Press.)
    • A famous discussion of altruism and related topics. Focus, however, is not just to rebut egoistic theories of motivation but also neo-Humean desire-based ones, which are related more to the distinct debate about the role of “reason” in motivation.
  • Nisbett, R. E. & T. D. Wilson (1977). “Telling More Than We Can Know: Verbal Reports on Mental Processes.” Psychological Review Vol. 84, No. 3, pp. 231–259.
    • A classic empirical investigation into the reliability and nature of introspective reports on one’s own mental states. Doubt is cast on the extent to which we have direct introspective access to higher-order cognitive processes.
  • Oldenquist, Andrew (1980). “The Possibility of Selfishness.” American Philosophical Quarterly Vol. 17, No. 1, pp. 25–33.
    • Argues that the natural state of humans is altruistic rather than egoistic. Emphasizes the importance of representations of oneself as oneself or as “I” in egoistic desires.
  • Rachels, James. (2003). The Elements of Moral Philosophy, 4th ed. McGraw-Hill. (First published in 1986.)
    • A popular contemporary introduction to moral philosophy. Ch. 5 contains a detailed discussion of psychological egoism. Like most philosophers, declares psychological egoism bankrupt based on the standard sorts of philosophical objections to it.
  • Raphael, D. D. (ed.) (1991). British Moralists: 1650-1800, 2 Vols. Indianapolis, Indiana: Hackett.
    • A two-volume collection of the moral and political writings of British philosophers from around the 17th Century, including Hobbes, Butler, Hume, and Bentham.
  • Rosas, Alejandro (2002). “Psychological and Evolutionary Evidence for Altruism.” Biology and Philosophy Vol. 17, No. 1, pp. 93–107.
    • A critique of Sober and Wilson’s claim that evolutionary theory resolves the egoism-altruism debate while social psychology doesn’t. Rosas argues that they should treat both similarly given the folk psychological framework they both employ.
  • Sidgwick, Henry (1874/1907). The Methods of Ethics, 7th ed. Indianapolis: Hackett Publish Company. (Reprinted in 1981 from the printing by Macmillan and Co., Ltd. First edition published in 1874.)
    • A classic, comprehensive ethical theory, which focuses on developing a kind of utilitarianism. A significant portion of it is devoted to various kinds of egoism. But he pretty clearly rejects psychological egoism, which is arguably contrary to several of his utilitarian predecessors.
  • Schroeder, Timothy (2004). Three Faces of Desire. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • A philosopher’s defense of a reward-based theory of desire that is grounded in empirical work largely from neuroscience.  Schroeder argues that pleasure-based theories, like Morillo’s, are not supported by recent findings, which undermines her empirical basis for psychological hedonism.
  • Schroeder, Timothy, Adina Roskies, & Shaun Nichols (2010). “Moral Motivation.” The Moral Psychology Handbook, John Doris & The Moral Psychology Research Group (eds.). Oxford University Press, pp. 72-110.
    • An examination of the neurological basis of moral motivation in the brain. Psychological hedonism is addressed briefly at the end.
  • Slote, Michael A. (1964). “An Empirical Basis for Psychological Egoism.” Journal of Philosophy Vol. 61, No. 18, pp. 530–537.
    • A philosopher’s defense of psychological egoism based on empirical work in psychology at the time, which was largely behavioristic in nature.
  • Sober, Elliott & D. S. Wilson (1998). Unto Others: The Evolution and Psychology of Unselfish Behavior. Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press.
    • A widely celebrated and influential book by a philosopher and biologist containing a sustained examination of the biological, psychological, and philosophical arguments for and against psychological egoism. They argue that philosophical arguments and Batson’s work in social psychology do not provide sufficient evidence either way, whereas evolutionary theory does, based on a group selection model.
  • Stich, Stephen, John M. Doris, & Erica Roedder (2010). “Altruism.” The Moral Psychology Handbook, John M. Doris and the Moral Psychology Research Group (eds.). Oxford University Press, pp. 147–205.
    • An overview of the philosophical, evolutionary, and psychological work relevant to the egoism-altruism debate. Focuses primarily on Sober and Wilson as well as Batson, arguing that psychological evidence has advanced the debate more than evolutionary arguments, though both are currently inconclusive.
  • Williams, Bernard (1973). “Egoism and Altruism.” Ch. 15 in Problems of the Self: Philosophical Papers 1956-1972, Cambridge University Press, pp. 250–265.
    • A discussion of egoism and altruism as related both to ethical theory and moral psychology. Williams considers and rejects various arguments for and against the existence of egoistic motives and the rationality of someone motivated by self-interest. He ultimately attempts to give a more Humean defense of altruism, as opposed to the more Kantian defenses found in Thomas Nagel, for example.
  • Warneken, Felix & Michael Tomasello (2007). “Helping and Cooperation at 14 Months of Age.” Infancy Vol. 11, No. 3, pp. 271–294.
    • Gathers empirical evidence about the prosocial behavior of young children—in particular that they will spontaneously help others who appear to be in need.

Author Information

Joshua May
Email: joshmay@uab.edu
University of Alabama at Birmingham
U. S. A.