Immanuel Kant: Philosophy of Religion

kant2Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) focused on elements of the philosophy of religion for about half a century─from the mid-1750s, when he started teaching philosophy, until after his retirement from academia.  Having been reared in a distinctively religious environment, he remained concerned about the place of religious belief in human thought and action.  As he moved towards the development of his own original philosophical system in his pre-critical period through the years in which he was writing each Critique and subsequent works all the way to the incomplete, fragmentary Opus Postumum of his old age, his attention to religious faith was an enduring theme.  His discussions of God and religion represent a measure of the evolution of his philosophical worldview.  This began with his pre-critical advocacy of the rationalism in which he was educated.  Then this got subjected to the systematic critique that would open the doors to his own unique critical treatment.  Finally, at the end of his life, he seemed to experiment with a more radical approach.  As we follow the trajectory of this development, we see Kant moving from confidently advocating a demonstrative argument for the God of metaphysics to denying all theoretical knowledge of a theological sort, to affirming a moral argument establishing religious belief as rational, to suspicions regarding religion divorced from morality, and finally to hints of an idea of God so identified with moral duty as to be immanent rather than transcendent.  The key text representing the revolutionary move from his pre-critical, rationalistic Christian orthodoxy to his critical position (that could later lead to those suggestions of heterodox religious belief) is his seminal Critique of Pure Reason.  In the preface to its second edition, in one of the most famous sentences he ever wrote, he sets the theme for this radical transition by writing, “I have therefore found it necessary to deny knowledge, in order to make room for faith” (Critique, B).  Though never a skeptic (for example, he was always committed to scientific knowledge), Kant came to limit knowledge to objects of possible experience and to regard ideas of metaphysics (including theology) as matters of rational faith.

Table of Contents

  1. Kant and Religion
  2. God in Some Pre-critical Writings
  3. Each Critique as Pivotal
    1. The First Critique
    2. The Second Critique
    3. The Third Critique
  4. The Prolegomena and Kant’s Lectures
    1. The Prolegomena
    2. Kant’s Lectures
  5. Other Important Works
  6. His Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone
  7. Some Tantalizing Suggestions from the Opus Postumum
  8. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Kant and Religion

This article does not present a full biography of Kant. A more general account of his life can be found in the article Kant’s Aesthetics.  But five matters should be briefly addressed as background for discussing his philosophical theology:  (1) his association with Pietism; (2) his wish to strike a reasonable balance between (the Christian) religion and (Newtonian physical) science; (3) his attempt to steer a middle path between the excesses of dogmatic modern rationalism and skeptical modern empiricism; (4) his commitment to the Enlightenment ideals; and (5) his unpleasant encounter with the Prussian censor over his religious writings.

Kant was born, raised, educated, worked, lived, and died in Königsberg (now Kaliningrad, part of Russia), the capital city of East Prussia.  His parents followed the Pietist movement in German Lutheranism, as he was brought up to do.  Pietism stressed studying the scriptures as a basis for personal devotion, lay governance of the church, the conscientious practice of Christian ethics, religious education emphasizing the development and exercising of values, and preaching designed to inculcate and promote piety in its adherents.  At the age of eight, the boy was sent to a Pietist school directed by his family’s pastor.  Eight years later, he enrolled in the University of Königsberg, where he came under the influence of a Pietist professor of logic and metaphysics.  Even during later decades of his life, when he ceased to practice religion publicly (see letter to Lavater in Correspondence, pp. 152-154) and found external displays of pious devotion distasteful, his thought and values continued to be influenced by the Pietism of his earlier years.

Second, as a university student, Kant became a follower of Newtonian science.  The dissertation for his graduate degree was more what we would consider physics than philosophy, although in those days it was called “natural philosophy.”  Many of his earliest writings were in Newtonian science, including his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens of 1755 (in Cosmogony), dedicated to his king, Frederick the Great, and propounding a nebular hypothesis to explain the formation of our solar system.  He had reason to worry that his thoroughly mechanistic explanation might run afoul of Biblical fundamentalists who advocated the traditional doctrine of strict creationism.  This is illustrative of a tension with which he had to deal all of his adult life—regarding how to reconcile Christian faith and scientific knowledge—which his philosophy of religion would address.

Third, although this is a bit of an oversimplification, before Kant, modern European philosophy was generally split into two rival camps:  the Continental Rationalists, following Descartes, subscribed to a theory of a priori innate ideas that provide a basis for universal and necessary knowledge, while the British Empiricists, following Locke, subscribed to a tabula rasa theory, denying innate ideas and maintaining that our knowledge must ultimately be based on sense experience.  This split vitally affected views regarding knowledge of God.  Descartes and his followers were convinced that a priori knowledge of the existence of God, as an infinitely perfect Being, was possible and favored (what Kant would later call) the Ontological Argument as a way to establish it.  By contrast, Locke and his followers spurned such a priori reasoning and resorted to empirical approaches, such as the Cosmological Argument and the Teleological Arguments or Design Arguments.  An important Continental Rationalist was the German Leibniz, whose philosophy was systematized by Christian Wolff; in the eighteenth century, the Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy was replacing scholasticism in German universities.  Kant’s family pastor and the professor who was so important in his education were both significantly influenced by Wolff’s philosophy, so that their young student was easily drawn into that orbit.  But he also came to study British Empiricists and was particularly disturbed by the challenges posed by the skeptical David Hume, which would gradually undermine his attachment to rationalism.  A vital feature of Kant’s mature philosophy is his attempt to work out a synthesis of these two great rival approaches.

Fourth, the eighteenth century was the heyday of the intellectual movement of the Enlightenment in Europe (as well as in North America), which was committed to ideals that Kant would appropriate as his own—including those of reason, experience, science, liberty, and progress.  Frederick II, who was the Prussian king for most of Kant’s adult life (from 1740 to 1786) was called both “Frederick the Great” and “the Enlightenment King.”  Hume and Wolff were both Enlightenment philosophers, as was Kant himself, who published a sort of manifesto for the movement, called “What Is Enlightenment?” (1784). There he calls his an age of developing enlightenment, though not yet a fully enlightened age.  He champions the cause of the free use of reason in public discussion, including freedom from censorship regarding publishing on religion (Essays, pp. 41-46).

Fifth, Kant himself faced a personal crisis when the Prussian government condemned his published book, Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone.  As long as Frederick the Great, “the Enlightenment King,” ruled, Kant and other Prussian scholars had broad latitude to publish controversial religious ideas in an intellectual atmosphere of general tolerance.  But Frederick was succeeded by his illiberal nephew, Frederick William II, who appointed a former preacher named Wöllner as his reactionary minister of spiritual affairs.  The anti-Enlightenment Wöllner issued edicts forbidding any deviations from orthodox Biblical doctrines and requiring approval by official state censors, prior to publication, for all works dealing with religion.  Kant managed to get the first book of his Religion cleared by one of Wöllner’s censors in Berlin.  But he was denied permission to publish Book II, which was seen as violating orthodox Biblical doctrines.  Having publicly espoused the right of scholars to publish even controversial ideas, Kant sought and got permission from the philosophical faculty at Jena (which also had that authority) to publish the second, third, and fourth books of his Religion and proceeded to do so.  When Wöllner found out about it, he was furious and sent Kant a letter, which he had written and signed, on behalf of the king, censuring Kant and threatening him with harsh consequences, should he ever repeat the offense.  Kant wrote a reply to the king, promising, “as your Majesty’s most loyal subject,” to refrain from all further public discussion of religion.  Until that king died (in 1797), Kant kept his promise.  But, as he later explained (Theology, pp. 239-243), that carefully worded qualifying phrase meant that the commitment would pass with that king, after whose death Kant, in fact, did resume publishing on religion.

2. God in Some Pre-critical Writings

Kant’s pre-critical writings are those that precede his Inaugural Dissertation of 1770, which marked his assumption of the chair in logic and metaphysics at the university.  These writings reflect a general commitment to the Leibnizian-Wolffian rationalist tradition.  Near the beginning of his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens of 1755, Kant observes that the harmonious order of the universe points to its divinely governing first Cause; near the end of it, he writes that even now the universe is permeated by the divine energy of an omnipotent Deity (Cosmogony, pp. 14 and 153).  In his New Exposition of the First Principles of Metaphysical Knowledge (of the same year), he points to God’s existence as the necessary condition of all possibility (Exposition, pp. 224-225).

In The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God of 1763, after warning his readers that any attempt at proving divine reality will plunge us into the “dark ocean without coasts and without lighthouses” that is metaphysics, he develops that line of argumentation towards God as the unconditioned condition of all possibility.  He denies the Cartesian thesis that existence is a predicate, thus undermining modern versions of the Ontological Argument.  The absolutely necessary Being that is the ground of all possibility must be one, simple, immutable, eternal, the highest reality, and a spirit, he argues.  He analyzes possible theoretical proofs of God into four possible sorts.  Two of these—the Ontological, which he rejects, and his own—are based on possibility; the other two—the Cosmological and the Teleological (Design), both of which he deems inconclusive—are empirical.  The final sentence of the book maintains that, though we must be convinced of God’s existence, logically demonstrating it is not required (Basis, pp. 43, 45, 57, 69, 71, 79, 81, 83, 87, 223, 225, 229, 231, and 239).  That same year, Kant also published his Enquiry concerning the Clarity of the Principles of Natural Theology and Ethics.  Here, while still expressing doubts that any metaphysical system of knowledge has yet been achieved, he nevertheless maintains his confidence that rational argumentation can lead to metaphysical knowledge, including that of God, as the absolutely necessary Being (Writings, pp. 14, 25, and 29-30).  What we see in these pre-critical writings is the stamp of Leibnizian-Wolffian rationalism, but also the developing influence of Hume, whom Kant was surely studying during this period.

3. Each Critique as Pivotal

The heart of Kant’s philosophical system is the triad of books constituting his great critiques:  his Critique of Pure Reason, published in 1781 (the A edition), with a significantly revised second edition appearing in 1787 (the B edition); his Critique of Practical Reason, published in 1788; and his Critique of Judgment, published in 1790.

a. The First Critique

Though some key ideas of the Critique of Pure Reason were adumbrated in Kant’s Inaugural Dissertation of 1770 (in Writings), this first Critique is revolutionary in the sense that, because of it, the history of philosophy became radically different from what it had been before its publication.  We cannot adequately explore all of the game-changing details of the epistemology (theory of knowledge) he develops there, which has been discussed elsewhere in the IEP (see “Immanuel Kant: Metaphysics”), but will only consider the elements that have a direct bearing on his philosophy of religion.

The monumental breakthrough of this book is Kant’s invention of the transcendental method in philosophy, which allows him to discover a middle path between modern rationalism, which attributes intellectual intuition (for example, innate ideas) to humans, enabling them to have universal and necessary factual knowledge, and modern empiricism, which maintains that we only have sensible intuition, making it difficult to see how we can ever achieve universal and necessary factual knowledge through reason.  Kant argues that both sides are partly correct and partly mistaken.  He agrees with the empiricists that all human factual knowledge begins with sensible intuition (which is the only sort we have), but avoids the skeptical conclusions to which this leads them by agreeing with the rationalists that we bring something a priori to the knowing process, while rejecting their dogmatic assumption that it must be the innate ideas of intellectual intuition.  According to Kant, universal and necessary factual knowledge requires both sensible experience, providing its content, and a priori structures of the mind, providing its form.  Either without the other is insufficient.  He famously writes, “Thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind” (Critique, A51/B75).  Without empirical, sensible content, there is nothing for us to know; but without those a priori structures, we have no way of giving intelligible form to whatever content we may have.

The transcendental method seeks the necessary a priori conditions of experience, of knowledge, and of metaphysical speculation.  The two a priori forms of sensibility are time and space:  that is, for us to make sense of them, all objects of sensation, whether external or internal, must be temporally organizable and all objects of external sensation must also be spatially organizable.  But time and space are only forms of experience and not objects of experience, and they can only be known to apply to objects of sensible intuition.  When sensory inputs are received by us and spatio-temporally organized, the a priori necessary condition of our having objective knowledge is that one or more of twelve concepts of the understanding, also called “categories,” must be applied to our spatio-temporal representations.  These twelve categories include reality, unity, substance, causality, and existence.  Again, none of them is an object of experience; rather, they are all categories of the human mind, necessary for our knowing any objects of experience.  And, again, they can only be known to apply to objects of sensible intuition.  Now, by its very nature, metaphysics (including theology) necessarily speculates about ultimate reality that is not given to sensible intuition and therefore transcends any and all human perceptual experience.  It is a fact of human experience that we do engage in metaphysical speculation.  So what are the transcendental conditions of our capacity to do so?  Kant’s answer is that they are the three a priori ideas of pure reason—the self or soul, the cosmos or universe as an orderly whole, and God, the one of direct concern to us here.  But, as we never can have sensible experience of objects corresponding to such transcendent ideas and as the concepts of the understanding, without which human knowledge is impossible, can only be known to apply to objects of possible experience, knowledge of the soul, of the cosmos, and of God is impossible, in principle.

So what are we to make of ideas that can never yield knowledge?  Here Kant makes another innovative contribution to epistemology.  He says that ideas can have two possible functions in human thinking.  Some (for example, empirical) ideas have a “constitutive” function, in that they can be used to constitute knowledge, while others have only a “regulative” function (Critique, A180/B222), in that, while they can never constitute knowledge, they do serve the heuristic purpose of regulating our thought and action.  This is related to Kant’s dualistic distinction between the aspect of reality that comprises all phenomenal appearances and that which involves our noumenal ideas of things-in-themselves.  (Although it is important, we cannot here explore this distinction in the depth it deserves.)  Because metaphysical ideas are unknowable, they cannot serve any “constitutive” function.  Still, they have great “regulative” value for both our thinking and our voluntary choices.  They are relevant to our value-commitments, including those of a religious sort.  Three such regulative ideas are Kant’s postulates of practical reason, which are “God, freedom, and immortality” (Critique, A3/B7).  Although none of them refers to an object of empirical knowledge, he maintains that it is reasonable for us to postulate them as matters of rational faith.  This sort of belief, which is subjectively, but not objectively, justifiable, is a middle ground between certain knowledge, which is objectively, as well as subjectively, justified, and mere arbitrary opinion, which is not even subjectively justified (Critique, A822/B850).  Such rational belief can be religious—namely, faith in God.

Kant presents four logical puzzles that he calls “antinomies” to establish the natural  dialectical illusions that our reason inevitably encounters when it engages metaphysical questions about cosmology in an open-minded fashion.  The fourth of these particularly concerns us here, as reason purports to be able to prove both that there must be an absolutely necessary Being and that no such Being can exist.  His dualism can expose this apparent contradiction as bogus, maintaining that in the realm of phenomenal appearances, everything exists contingently, with no necessary Being, but that in the realm of noumenal things-in-themselves there can be such a necessary Being.

But, we might wonder, what about the traditional arguments for God?  If even one of them proves logically conclusive, would not that constitute some sort of knowledge of God?  Here we encounter yet another great passage in the first Critique, where Kant’s epistemology leads him to a trenchant undermining of all such arguments.  He maintains that there is a trichotomy of types of speculative arguments for God:  the “physico-theological” Argument from Design, various Cosmological Arguments, and the non-empirical "Ontological" Argument.  He cleverly shows that the first of these, even if it worked, would only establish a relatively intelligent and powerful architect of the world and not a necessarily existing Creator.  In order to establish it as a necessary Being, some version of the second approach is needed.  But, if that worked, it would still fail to show that the necessary creator is an infinitely perfect Being, worthy of religious devotion.  Only the Ontological Argument will suffice to establish that.  But here the problems accumulate.  The Ontological Argument fails because it tries to attribute infinite, necessary existence to God; but existence, far from being a real predicate of anything, is merely a concept of the human understanding.  Then the cosmological arguments also fail, in trying to establish that God is the necessary ultimate cause of the world, for both causality and necessity are merely categories of human understanding.  Although Kant exhibits considerable respect for the teleological argument from design, in addition to its conclusion being so disappointingly limited, it also fails as a logical demonstration, in trying to show that an intelligent Designer must exist to account for the alleged intelligent design of the world. The problem is that we do not and cannot ever experience the world as a coherent whole, so that the argument’s premise is merely assumed without foundation.  Thus Kant undermines the entire project of any philosophical theology that pretends to establish any knowledge of God (Critique, A592/B620-A614/B642 and A620/B648-A636/B664).  Yet he remains a champion of religious faith as rationally justifiable.  So how can he make such a position philosophically credible?

b. The Second Critique

Here we must turn to his ingenious Critique of Practical Reason.  Although it is essentially a work of ethics, a significant part of it is devoted to establishing belief in God (as well as in the immortality of the soul) as a rationally justifiable postulate of practical reason, by means of what has come to be called his “moral argument.”  The argument hinges on his claim that we have a moral duty to help bring about, not just the supreme good of moral virtue, which we can achieve by our own efforts in this life, but also “the highest good,” which is  the “perfect” correlation of “happiness in exact proportion to morality.”  Since there cannot be any moral obligation that it is impossible to meet (“ought” implies “can”), achieving this highest good must be possible.  However, there is no reason to believe that it can ever be achieved by us alone, acting either individually or collectively, in this life.  So it would seem that all our efforts in this life cannot suffice to achieve the highest good.  Yet there must be such a sufficient condition, supernatural and with attributes far exceeding ours, identifiable with God, with whom we can collaborate in the achievement of the highest good, not merely here and now but in the hereafter.  Thus he establishes God and human immortality as “morally necessary” hypotheses, matters of “rational faith.”  This is also the basis of Kant’s idea of moral religion, which we shall discuss in more detail below.  But, for now, we can observe his definition of “religion” as “the recognition of all duties as divine commands.”  Thus the moral argument is not purely speculative but has a practical orientation.  Kant does not pretend that the moral argument is constitutive of any knowledge.  If he did, it could be easily refuted by denying that we have any obligation to achieve the highest good, because it is, for us, an impossible ideal.  The moral argument rather deals with God as a regulative idea that can be shown to be a matter of rational belief.  The famous sentence near the end of the second Critique provides a convenient bridge between it and the third:  “Two things fill the mind with ever new and increasing admiration and awe, the oftener and more steadily we reflect on them:  the starry heavens above me and the moral law within me” (Reason, pp. 114-115/AA V: 110-111, 126-130/AA V: 121-126, 134/AA V: 129-130, and 166/AA V: 161).  As morality leads Kant to God and religion, so does the awesome teleological order of the universe.

c. The Third Critique

Although Kant’s Critique of Judgment is also not essentially a work in the philosophy of religion, its long appendix contains an important section that is germane for our purposes.  We recall that, while criticizing the teleological argument from design, Kant exhibited a high regard for it.  Such physical teleology points to a somewhat intelligent and powerful designing cause of the world.  But now Kant pursues moral teleology, which will connect such a deity to our own practical purposes—not only to our natural desire for happiness, but to our moral worthiness to achieve it, which is a function of our own virtuous good will.  He gives us another version of his moral argument for God, conceived not as the amoral, impersonal metaphysical principle indicated by the teleological argument from design, but rather as a personal deity who is the moral legislator and governor of the world.  Again, all this points to God as a regulative matter of “moral faith,” without any pretense of establishing any theological knowledge (which would violate Kant’s own epistemology).  Such faith is inescapably doubtful, in that it remains reasonable to maintain some doubt regarding it, and a matter of trust in teleological ends towards which we should be striving.  Nor should we be so presumptuous as to suppose that we can ever comprehend God’s nature or purposes.  It is only by analogy that we can contemplate such matters at all (Judgment, pp. 295-338/AA II: 442-485), a point which Kant more carefully develops in his Prolegomena.

4. The Prolegomena and Kant’s Lectures

a. The Prolegomena

Most—but not all—of the religious epistemology that is of note in Kant’s Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics is already contained in his more philosophically impressive first Critique and will not be repeated here.  But a few pages of its “Conclusion” add something that we have not yet considered.  One of the abiding problems of the philosophy of religion is how we can speak (and even think) about God except in anthropomorphic human terms without resorting to an indeterminate fog of ineffable mysticism.  The great rationalists are particularly challenged here, and Hume, whom Kant credits with awaking him from his dogmatic slumbers, mercilessly exploits their dilemma.  Kant’s project continues to be to navigate a perilous middle path between the equally problematic approaches of anthropomorphism  and mysticism.  Kant appreciates the dilemma as acutely as Hume, but wants to solve it rather than merely highlighting it.  Hume means to replace theism with an indeterminate deism.  Kant, himself a theist, admits that Hume’s objections against theism are devastating but holds that his arguments undermine only attempted deistic proofs and not deistic beliefs.  Remembering that the concepts of the understanding cannot be known to apply to anything that transcends all possible experience, we can see that it will be a challenge for Kant to evade Hume’s dilemma.  His approach is to distinguish between a malignant “dogmatic anthropomorphism,” which tries literally to attribute to God natural qualities, such as those attributable to humans, and a more benign “symbolic anthropomorphism,” which merely draws an analogy between God’s relation to our world and relations among things in our world, while avoiding thinking of them as identical.  Kant’s example is helpful here:  while we have no possible natural knowledge of God’s love for us and should acknowledge that it cannot be identical to any (necessarily limited) human love, we can use analogical language to think and talk about God’s love for us—as the love of human parents is directed to the welfare of their children, so God’s love for us is directed to human well-being.  Thus, Kant maintains, we can avoid the vicious sort of dogmatic anthropomorphism which Hume rightly attacks and, for example, attribute to God a rational relationship to our world without pretending that divine reason is exactly the same as ours, for example, discursive and, thus, limited  (Prolegomena, pp. 5, 19, and 96-99).  Thinking and speaking of God with analogous language can facilitate a theology that neither is anthropomorphic in a bad way nor succumbs to the dialectical illusions from which Kant’s epistemology would save us.

b. Kant’s Lectures

A somewhat neglected, but still important, dimension of Kant’s philosophy of religion can be found in his Lectures on Philosophical Theology, which comprises an introduction, a first part on transcendental theology, and a second part on moral theology.  After maintaining that rational theology’s essential value is practical rather than speculative, he defines religion as “the application of theology to morality,” which is a bit broader than the definition of the second Critique but is in line with it.  He conceives of the God of rational theology as the causal author and moral ruler of the world.  He considers himself a theist rather than a deist because he is committed to a free and moral “living God,” holy and just, as well as omniscient and omnipotent, as a postulate of practical reason (Lectures, pp. 24, 26, 30, and 41-42).  In the first part of the Lectures, Kant considers the speculative proofs of God, as well as the use of analogous language as a hedge against gross anthropomorphism.  But, as we have already discussed the more famous treatments of these topics (in the first Critique and the Prolegomena, respectively), we can pass over these here.

The second part of the Lectures starts with a version of the moral argument, which we have already considered (in connection with its more famous treatment in the second Critique).  This line of reasoning leads to the moral attributes of “God as a holy lawgiver, a benevolent sustainer of the world, and a just judge.”  A major problem of the philosophy of religion we have yet to consider is the problem of evil.  If, indeed, an infinitely perfect and supremely moral God governs the world with divine providence, how can there be so much evil, in all its multiple forms, in that world?  More specifically, for Kant, how can moral evil be consistent with divine holiness, pain and suffering with divine benevolence, and morally undeserved well-being and the lack of it with divine justice?  Despite God’s holiness, moral evil is a function of our  free will as rational creatures and our responsibility for our own development.  Despite God’s benevolence towards personal creatures, the physical evils of pain and suffering provide incentives for our progressing towards fulfillment.  And, despite God’s justice, the disproportion between virtue and well-being in this life must be temporary, to be rectified hereafter (Lectures, pp. 112 and 115-121).  This earlier (from the 1780s) attempt at theodicy on Kant’s part was neither particularly original nor particularly convincing.

5. Other Important Works

Kant deals with the problem of evil more impressively in his “On the Miscarriage of All Philosophical Trials in Theodicy” (1791).  He analyzes possible attempts at theodicy into three approaches:  (a) it can argue that what we consider evil actually is not, so that there is really no conflict; (b) it can argue that the conflict between evil and God is naturally necessitated; and (c) it can argue that evil, though contingent, is the result of someone other than God.  Kant’s own earlier work attempted to combine the second and third strategies; but here he concludes that all of these approaches must fail.  More specifically, attempts to show that there is no pernicious conflict between moral evil and God’s holiness,   between the physical evils of pain and suffering and God’s goodness,  and, finally, between the disproportion of happiness and misery to virtue and vice and God’s justice, all fail using all three approaches.  Thus Kant’s considered conclusion is negative:  the doubts that are legitimately raised by the evil in our world can neither be conclusively answered nor conclusively refute God’s infinite moral wisdom.  Thus, theodicy, like matters of religion more generally, turns out to be a matter of faith and not one of knowledge (Theology, pp. 24-34; see also “What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” in Theology pp. 12-15, and “Speculative Beginning of Human History,” in Essays).  In a work published the year he died, Kant analyzes the core of his theological doctrine into three articles of faith:  (1) he believes in one God, who is the causal source of all good in the world; (2) he believes in the possibility of harmonizing God’s purposes with our greatest good; and (3) he believes in human immortality as the necessary condition of our continued approach to the highest good possible (Metaphysics, p. 131).  All of these doctrines of faith can be rationally supported.  This leaves open the issue of whether further religious beliefs, drawn from revelation, can be added to this core.  As Kant makes clear in The Conflict of the Faculties, he does not deny that divinely revealed truths are possible, but only that they are knowable.  So, we might wonder, of what practical use is revelation if it cannot be an object of knowledge?  His answer is that, even if it can never constitute knowledge, it can serve the regulative function of edification—contributing to our moral improvement and adding motivation to our moral purposes (Theology, pp. 283 and 287-288).

6. His Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone

Kant’s Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone of 1793 is considered by some to be the most underrated book in the entire history of the philosophy of religion.  In a letter to a theologian, he subsequently repeats the questions with which he thinks any philosophical system should deal (three of them in his first Critique, A 805/B 833; see also his Logic, pp. 28-30, where he adds a fourth).  The first one, regarding human knowledge, had been covered in the first Critique and the Prolegomena; the second, regarding practical values, was considered in his various writings on ethics and socio-political philosophy; the fourth, regarding human nature, had been covered in his philosophical anthropology. Now,  with Religion, Kant addresses the third question of what we can reasonably hope for, and moves towards completing his system (Correspondence, pp. 458-459).  Thus we can conclude that Kant himself sees this book, the publication of which got him into trouble with the Prussian government, as crucial to his philosophical purposes.  Hence we should take it seriously here as representative of his own rational theology.  In his Preface to the first edition, he again points out that reflection on moral obligation should lead us to religion (Religion, pp. 3-6; see also Education, pp. 111-114, for his analysis of how religion should be taught to children).  In his Preface to the second edition, he offers an illuminating metaphor of two concentric circles—the inner one representing the core of the one religion of pure moral reason and the outer one representing many revealed historical religions, all of which should include and build on that core (Religion, p. 11).

In the first book, Kant considers our innate natural predisposition to good (in being animals, humans, and persons) and our equally innate propensity to evil (in our frailty, impurity, and wickedness).  Whether we end up being praiseworthy or blameworthy depends, not on our sensuous nature or our theoretical reason, but on the use we make of our free will, which is naturally oriented towards both good and evil.  There are two dimensions of what we call “will,” both of which are important in grasping Kant’s view here.  On the one hand, there is our capacity for free choice (his word is “Willkür”); on the other hand, there is practical reason as rationally legislating moral choice and action (“Wille”).  Thus a “good will” chooses in accordance with the rational demands of the moral law.  At any rate, we are born with a propensity to evil; but whether we become evil depends on our own free acts of will.  Thus Kant demythologizes the Christian doctrine of original sin.  He then distinguishes between the phony religion of mere worship designed to win favor for ourselves and the authentic moral religion of virtuous behavior.  Although it is legitimate to hope for God’s grace as helping us to lead morally good lives, it is mere fanaticism to imagine that we can become good by soliciting grace rather than freely choosing virtuous conduct (Religion, pp. 21-26, 30, 32, 35, and 47-49).

In the second book, Jesus of Nazareth is presented as an archetype symbolizing our ability to resist our propensity to evil and to approach the virtuous ideal of moral perfection.  What Kant does not say is whether or not, in addition to being a moral model whose example we should try to follow, Jesus is also of divine origin in some unique manner attested to by miracles.  Just as he neither denies nor affirms the divinity of Christ, so Kant avoids committing himself regarding belief in miracles, which can lead us into superstition (Religion, pp. 51, 54, 57, 74, 77, and 79-82; for more on the mystery of the Incarnation, see Theology, pp. 264-265).

In the third book, Kant expresses his rational hope for the ultimate supremacy of good over evil and the establishment of an ethical commonwealth of persons under a personal God, who is the divine law-giver and moral ruler—the ideal of the invisible church, as opposed to actual realities of visible churches.  Whereas statutory religion focuses on obedient external behavior, true religion concerns internal commitment (or good will).  Mere worship is a worthless substitute for good choices and virtuous conduct.  Here Kant makes a particularly provocative claim, that, ultimately, there is only “one (true) religion,” the religion of morality, while there can be various historical “faiths” promoting it.  From this perspective, Judaism, Islam, and the various denominations of Christianity are all legitimate faiths, to be located in Kant’s metaphorical outer circle, including the true religion of morality, his metaphorical inner circle.  However, some faiths can be relatively more adequate expressions of the religion of moral reason than others (Religion, pp. 86, 89-92, 95, and 97-98; see also Theology, pp. 262-265).

In his particularly inflammatory fourth book, Kant probes the distinction between legitimate religious service and the pseudo-service of religious clericalism.  From our human perspective, religion—both revealed and natural—should be regarded as “the recognition of all duties as divine commands.”  Kant embraces the position of “pure rationalist,” rather than naturalism (which denies divine revelation) or pure supernaturalism (which considers it necessary), in that he accepts the possibility of revelation but does not dogmatically regard it as necessary.  He acknowledges scripture scholars’ valuable role in helping to disseminate religious truth so long as they respect “universal human reason as the supremely commanding principle.”  Christianity is both a natural and a revealed religion, and Kant shows how the gospel of Matthew expresses Kantian ethics, with Jesus as its wise moral teacher.  Following his moral teachings is the means to true religious service, whereas substituting an attachment to external worship allegedly required instead of moral behavior is mere “pseudo-service.” Superstition and fanaticism are typical aspects of such illusions and substituting superstitious rituals for morally virtuous conduct  is mere “fetishism.”  Kant denounces clericalism as promoting such misguided pseudo-service.  The ideal of genuine godliness comprises a combination of fear of God and love of God, which should converge to help render us persons of morally good will.  So what about such religious practices as prayer, church attendance, and participation in sacraments?  They can be either good expressions of devotion, if they bind us together in moral community (occupying Kant’s inner circle) or bad expressions of mere pseudo-service, if designed to ingratiate us with God (an accretion to the outer circle not rooted in the inner circle of genuine moral commitment).  Mere external shows of piety must never be substituted for authentic inner virtue (Religion, pp. 142-143, 147-153, 156-158, 162, 165, 167-168, 170, and 181-189; cf. Ethics, pp. 78-116).  Kant’s Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone provides a capstone for the revolutionary treatment of religion associated with his critical philosophy.

7. Some Tantalizing Suggestions from the Opus Postumum

Yet it is quite admirable that, in the last few years of his life, despite struggling with the onset of dementia that made any such task increasingly challenging, he kept trying to explore new dimensions of the philosophy of religion.  As has already been admitted, the results, located in his fragmentary Opus Postumum, are more provocative than satisfying; yet they are nevertheless worthy of brief consideration here.  The work comprises a vast quantity of scattered remarks, many of which are familiar to readers of his earlier writings, but some of which represent acute, fresh insights, albeit none of them adequately developed.  Here again Kant  writes that reflection on moral duty, determinable by means of the categorical imperative, can reasonably lead us to the idea of God, as a rational moral agent with unlimited power over the realms of nature and of freedom, who prescribes our duties as divine commands.   He then adds a bold idea, which breaks with his own previous orthodox theological concept of a transcendent God.  Developing his old notion of God as “an ideal of human reason,” he identifies God with our concept of moral duty rather than as an independent substance.  This notion of an immanent God (that is, one internal to our world rather than transcendently separate from it), while not carefully worked out by Kant himself, would be developed by later German Idealists (most significantly, Hegel).  While conceding that we think of God as an omnipotent, omniscient, and omnibenevolent personal Being, Kant now denies that personality can be legitimately attributed to God—again stepping out of mainstream Judeo-Christian doctrine.  Also, rather than still postulating God as an independent reality, he here says that “God and the world are correlates,” interdependent and mutually implicating one another.  Unfortunately, we can only conjecture as to what, exactly, he means by this claim.  Referring to Spinoza (the most important pre-Kantian panentheist in modern philosophy), he pushes the point even more radically, writing, “I am in the highest being.”  But, then,   Kant goes on to condemn Spinoza’s panentheistic conception of God (that is, the view also found in  Hegel, that God contains our world rather than transcending it) as outlandish “enthusiastic” fanaticism. In fact, he suggests the inverse—instead of holding that we are in God, Kant now indicates that God is in us, though different from us,  in that God's reality is ideal rather than substantial.  He proceeds to maintain that not only God is infinite, but so are the world and rational freedom, identifying God with “the inner vital spirit of man in the world.”  Kant makes one final controversial claim  when he denies that a concept of God is even essential to religion (Opus, pp. 200-204, 210-211, 213-214, 225, 229, 231, 234-236, 239-240, and 248).  This denial is clearly not an aspect of Kant’s thought that is familiar and famous, and we should beware of presuming that we understand precisely what should be made of it.  But what is undeniable is what a long and soaring intellectual journey Kant made as he developed his ideas on God and religion from his pre-critical writings through the central, revolutionary works of his philosophical maturity and into the puzzling but tantalizing thought-experiments of his old age.

8. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • Immanuel Kant, “An Answer to the Question:  What is Enlightenment?” trans. Ted Humphrey, in Essays.
  • Immanuel Kant, The Conflict of the Faculties, trans. Mary J. Gregor and Robert Anchor, in Theology.
  • Immanuel Kant, Correspondence, trans. and edited by Arnulf Zweig.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Immanuel Kant, Critique of Judgment, trans. J. H. Bernard (called “Judgment”).  New York: Hafner, 1968. References to this translation are accompanied by references to the Akademie Ausgabe Volume II.
  • Immanuel Kant, Critique of Practical Reason, trans. Lewis White Beck (called “Reason”).  Indianapolis:  Bobbs-Merrill, 1956. References to this translation are accompanied by references to the Akademie Ausgabe Volume V.
  • Immanuel Kant, Critique of Pure Reason, trans. Norman Kemp Smith (called Critique).  New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1965. References are to the A and B German editions.
  • Immanuel Kant, Education, trans. Annette Churton.  Ann Arbor:  University of Michigan Press, 1960.
  • Immanuel Kant, “The End of All Things,” trans. Allen W. Wood, in Theology.
  • Immanuel Kant, Enquiry concerning the Clarity of the Principles of Natural Theology and Ethics, trans. G. B. Kerford and D. E. Walford, in Writings.
  • Immanuel Kant, Kant’s Cosmogony, trans. W. Hastie (called “Cosmogony”).  New York:  Garland, 1968.
  • Immanuel Kant, Lectures on Ethics, trans. Louis Infield (called “Ethics”).  New York:  Harper & Row, 1963.
  • Immanuel Kant, Lectures on Philosophical Theology, trans. Allen W. Wood and Gertrude M. Clark (called “Lectures”).  Ithaca, NY:  Cornell University Press, 1978.
  • Immanuel Kant, Logic, trans. Robert Hartman and Wolfgang Schwarz.  Indianapolis:  Bobbs-Merrill, 1974.
  • Immanuel Kant, New Exposition of the First Principles of Metaphysical Knowledge, trans. F. E. England (called “Exposition”), in England (below).
  • Immanuel Kant, On the Form and Principles of the Sensible and Intelligible World (Inaugural Dissertation), trans. G. B. Kerford and D. E. Walford, in Writings.
  • Immanuel Kant, “On the Miscarriage of All Philosophical Trials in Theodicy,” trans. George di Giovanni, in Theology.
  • Immanuel Kant, The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God, trans. Gordon Treash (called “Basis”).  Lincoln:  University of Nebraska Press, 1994.
  • Immanuel Kant, Opus Postumum, edited by Eckart Förster and trans. Eckart Förster and Michael Rosen (called “Opus”).  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Immanuel Kant, Perpetual Peace and Other Essays, trans. Ted Humphrey (called “Essays”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1983.
  • Immanuel Kant, Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics, trans. Paul Carus and revised by James W. Ellington (called “Prolegomena”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1977.
  • Immanuel Kant, Religion and Rational Theology, trans. and edited by Allen W. Wood and George di Giovanni (called “Theology”).  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Immanuel Kant, Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone, trans. Theodore M. Greene and Hoyt H. Hudson (called “Religion”).  New York:  Harper & Row, 1960.
  • Immanuel Kant, Selected Pre-Critical Writings and Correspondence with Beck, trans. G. B. Kerford and D. E. Walford (called “Writings”).  Manchester:  Manchester University Press, 1968.
  • Immanuel Kant, “Speculative Beginning of Human History,” trans. Ted Humphrey, in Essays.
  • Immanuel Kant, Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens, trans. W. Hastie, in Cosmogony.
  • Immanuel Kant, “What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?”, trans. Allen W. Wood, in Theology.
  • Immanuel Kant, What Real Progress Has Metaphysics Made in Germany since the Time of Leibniz and Wolff?, trans. Ted Humphrey (called “Metaphysics”).  New York:  Abaris Books, 1983.

b. Secondary Sources

  • James Collins, The Emergence of Philosophy of Religion.  New Haven:  Yale University Press, 1967.
    • Chapters 3 through 5 deal with Kant’s philosophy of religion in a meticulous manner.
  • Frederick Copleston, S. J., A History of Philosophy, Volume 6.  Garden City:  Image Books, 1964.
    • Though old, this volume still represents exemplary Kant scholarship.
  • A. Hazard Dakin, “Kant and Religion," in The Heritage of Kant, edited by George Tapley Whitney and David F. Bowers.   New York:  Russell & Russell, 1962.
    • This is a non-technical critical analysis of Kant’s views on religion.
  • Michel Despland, Kant on History and Religion.  Montreal:  McGill-Queen’s University Press, 1973.
    • The second part of this book offers a detailed coverage of Kant’s philosophy of religion.
  • George di Giovanni, “Translator’s Introduction” to Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, in Theology, pp. 41-54.
    • This is an informative account of the history of Kant’s Religion.
  • S. Morris Engel, “Kant’s ‘Refutation’ of the Ontological Argument,” in Kant:  A Collection of Critical Essays, edited by Robert Paul Wolff.  Garden City:  Anchor Books, 1967.
    • This remains a provocative critical analysis of Kant’s critique of this argument.
  • F. E. England, Kant’s Conception of God.  New York:  Humanities Press, 1968.
    • This is a very good study of Kant’s development of a philosophy of religion.
  • Chris L. Firestone and Nathan Jacobs, In Defense of Kant’s Religion.  Bloomington:  Indiana University Press, 2008.
    • This book cleverly presents criticisms of Kant’s views answered by defenses.
  • Chris L. Firestone and Stephen R. Palmquist, editors, Kant and the New Philosophy of Religion.  Bloomington:  Indiana University Press, 2006.
    • This is a good anthology of recent essays from both philosophical and theological perspectives.
  • Chris L. Firestone, “Making Sense Out of Tradition:  Theology and Conflict in Kant’s Philosophy of Religion,” in Kant and the New Philosophy of Religion, pp. 141-156.
    • This article does a good job of explaining Kant’s views on the proper roles of philosophers and theologians in dealing with religion.
  • Eckart Förster, Kant’s Final Synthesis:  An Essay on the Opus Postumum.  Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 2000.
    • This is a close study of Kant’s final work.
  • Theodore M. Greene, “The Historical Context and Religious Significance of Kant’s Religion,” translator’s introduction to Religion.
    • This offers a long and still valuable perspective on Kant’s major work in the philosophy of religion.
  • Manfred Kuehn, Kant:  A Biography.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 2001.
    • This is arguably the best intellectual biography of Kant in English.
  • G. E. Michalson, Jr., The Historical Dimensions of a Rational Faith:  The Role of History in Kant’s Religious Thought.  Washington, DC:  University Press of America, 1979.
    • This book relates Kant’s views on religion to his conception of history.
  • Stephen R. Palmquist, “Introduction” to Religion within the Bounds of Bare Reason, trans. Werner S. Pluhar.  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 2009.
    • This is a long and careful introduction to yet another translation of Kant’s most important book in the philosophy of religion.
  • Stephen R. Palmquist, Kant’s Critical Religion.  Aldershot, UK:  Ashgate, 2000.
    • This book explores its subject in astonishing detail.
  • Wayne P. Pomerleau, Western Philosophies of Religion.  New York:  Ardsley House, 1998.
    • The sixth chapter of this book is a detailed study of Kant’s philosophy of religion.
  • Bernard M. G. Reardon, Kant as Philosophical Theologian.  Totowa, NJ:  Barnes & Noble Books, 1988.
    • This fairly short book nevertheless develops a penetrating analysis of the subject.
  • Philip J. Rossi and Michael Wreen, editors, Kant’s Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered.  Bloomington:  Indiana University Press, 1991.
    • This anthology contains some valuable essays on Kant’s theory.
  • Clement C. J. Webb, Kant’s Philosophy of Religion.  Oxford:  Oxford University Press, 1926.
    • This classic general treatment of this topic is still valuable.
  • Allen W. Wood, “General Introduction” to Theology, pp. xi-xxiv.
    • This is brief but, like all of Wood’s work on this subject, well done.
  • Allen W. Wood, “Kant’s Deism,” in Kant’s Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered, pp. 1-21.
    • This is a provocative article considering the pros and cons of regarding Kant as a deist.
  • Allen W. Wood, Kant’s Moral Religion.  Ithaca, NY:  Cornell University Press, 1970.
    • This is an excellent treatment of Kant’s view of morality as the core of true religion.
  • Allen W. Wood, Kant’s Rational Theology.  Ithaca, NY:  Cornell University Press, 1978.
    • This book is more focused on Kant’s critique of speculative theology.
  • Allen W. Wood, “Rational Theology, Moral Faith, and Religion,” in The Cambridge Companion to Kant, edited by Paul Guyer.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1992.
    • This essay offers an illuminating connection of important strands of Kant’s philosophy of religion.


Author Information

Wayne P. Pomerleau
Gonzaga University
U. S. A.


Metaethics is a branch of analytic philosophy that explores the status, foundations, and scope of moral values, properties, and words. Whereas the fields of applied ethics and normative theory focus on what is moral, metaethics focuses on what morality itself is. Just as two people may disagree about the ethics of, for example, physician-assisted suicide, while nonetheless agreeing at the more abstract level of a general normative theory such as Utilitarianism, so too may people who disagree at the level of a general normative theory nonetheless agree about the fundamental existence and status of morality itself, or vice versa. In this way, metaethics may be thought of as a highly abstract way of thinking philosophically about morality. For this reason, metaethics is also occasionally referred to as “second-order” moral theorizing, to distinguish it from the “first-order” level of normative theory.

Metaethical positions may be divided according to how they respond to questions such as the following:

  • Ÿ  What exactly are people doing when they use moral words such as “good” and “right”?
  • Ÿ  What precisely is a moral value in the first place, and are such values similar to other familiar sorts of entities, such as objects and properties?
  • Ÿ  Where do moral values come from—what is their source and foundation?
  • Ÿ  Are some things morally right or wrong for all people at all times, or does morality instead vary from person to person, context to context, or culture to culture?

Metaethical positions respond to such questions by examining the semantics of moral discourse, the ontology of moral properties, the significance of anthropological disagreement about moral values and practices, the psychology of how morality affects us as embodied human agents, and the epistemology of how we come to know moral values. The sections below consider these different aspects of metaethics.

Table of Contents

  1. History of Metaethics
    1. Metaethics before Moore
    2. Metaethics in the Twentieth-Century
  2. The Normative Relevance of Metaethics
  3. Semantic Issues in Metaethics
    1. Cognitivism versus Non-Cognitivism
    2. Theories of Moral Truth
  4. Ontological Issues in Metaethics
    1. Moral Realisms
    2. Moral Relativisms
  5. Psychology and Metaethics
    1. Motivation and Moral Reasons
    2. Experimental Metaethics
    3. Moral Emotions
  6. Epistemological Issues in Metaethics
    1. Thick and Thin Moral Concepts
    2. Moral Justification and Explanation
  7. Anthropological Considerations
    1. Cross-Cultural Differences
    2. Cross-Cultural Similarities
  8. Political Implications of Metaethics
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Textual Citations
    2. Anthologies and Introductions

1. History of Metaethics

a. Metaethics before Moore

Although the word “metaethics” (more commonly “meta-ethics” among British and Australian philosophers) was coined in the early part of the twentieth century, the basic philosophical concern regarding the status and foundations of moral language, properties, and judgments goes back to the very beginnings of philosophy. Several characters in Plato’s dialogues, for instance, arguably represent metaethical stances familiar to philosophers today: Callicles in Plato’s Gorgias (482c-486d) advances the thesis that Nature does not recognize moral distinctions, and that such distinctions are solely constructions of human convention; and Thrasymachus in Plato’s Republic (336b-354c) advocates a type of metaethical nihilism by defending the view that justice is nothing above and beyond whatever the strong say that it is. Socrates’ defense of the separation of divine commands from moral values in Plato’s Euthyphro (10c-12e) is also a forerunner of modern metaethical debates regarding the secular foundation of moral values. Aristotle’s grounding of virtue and happiness in the biological and political nature of humans (in Book One of his Nicomachean Ethics) has also been examined from the perspective of contemporary metaethics (compare, MacIntyre 1984; Heinaman 1995). In the classical Chinese tradition, early Daoist thinkers such as Zhuangzi have also been interpreted as weighing in on metaethical issues by critiquing the apparent inadequacy and conventionality of human attempts to reify moral concepts and terms (compare, Kjellberg & Ivanhoe 1996). Many Medieval accounts of morality that ground values in religious texts, commands, or emulation may also be understood as defending certain metaethical positions (see Divine Command Theory). In contrast, during the European Enlightenment, Immanuel Kant sought a foundation for ethics that was less prone to religious sectarian differences, by looking to what he believed to be universal capacities and requirements of human reason. In particular, Kant’s discussions in his Groundwork on the Metaphysics of Morals of a universal “moral law” necessitated by reason have been fertile ground for the articulation of many contemporary neo-Kantian defenses of moral objectivity (for example, Gewirth 1977; Boylan 2004).

Since metaethics is the study of the foundations, if any, of morality, it has flourished especially during historical periods of cultural diversity and flux. For example, responding to the cross-cultural contact engendered by the Greco-Persian Wars, the ancient Greek historian Herodotus reflected on the apparent challenge to cultural superiority posed by the fact that different cultures have seemingly divergent moral practices. A comparable interest in metaethics dominated seventeenth and eighteenth-century moral discourse in Western Europe, as theorists struggled to respond to the destabilization of traditional symbols of authority—for example, scientific revolutions, religious fragmentation, civil wars—and the grim pictures of human egoism that thinkers such as John Mandeville and Thomas Hobbes were presenting (compare, Stephen 1947). Most famously, the eighteenth-century Scottish philosopher David Hume may be understood as a forerunner of contemporary metaethics when he questioned the extent to which moral judgments might ultimately rest on human passions rather than reason, and whether certain virtues are ultimately natural or artificial (compare, Darwall 1995).

b. Metaethics in the Twentieth-Century

Analytic metaethics in its modern form, however, is generally recognized as beginning with the moral writings of G.E. Moore. (Although, see Hurka 2003 for an argument that Moore’s innovations must be contextualized by reference to the preceding thought of Henry Sidgwick.) In his groundbreaking Principia Ethica (1903), Moore urged a distinction between merely theorizing about moral goods on the one hand, versus theorizing about the very concept of “good” itself. (Moore’s specific metaethical views are considered in more detail in the sections below.) Following Moore, analytic moral philosophy became focused almost exclusively on metaethical questions for the next few decades, as ethicists debated whether or not moral language describes facts and whether or not moral properties can be scientifically or “naturalistically” analyzed. (See below for a more specific description of these different metaethical trends.) Then, in the 1970s, largely inspired by the work of philosophers such as John Rawls and Peter Singer, analytic moral philosophy began to refocus on questions of applied ethics and normative theories. Today, metaethics remains a thriving branch of moral philosophy and contemporary metaethicists frequently adopt an interdisciplinary approach to the study of moral values, drawing on disciplines as diverse as social psychology, cultural anthropology, comparative politics, as well as other fields within philosophy itself, such as metaphysics, epistemology, action theory, and the philosophy of science.

2. The Normative Relevance of Metaethics

Since philosophical ethics is often conceived of as a practical branch of philosophy—aiming at providing concrete moral guidance and justifications—metaethics sits awkwardly as a largely abstract enterprise that says little or nothing about real-life moral issues. Indeed, the pressing nature of such issues was part of the general migration back to applied and normative ethics in the politically-galvanized intellectual climate of the 1970s (described above). And yet, moral experience seems to furnish myriad examples of disagreement concerning not merely specific applied issues, or even the interpretations or applications of particular theories, but sometimes about the very place of morality in general within multicultural, secular, and scientific accounts of the world. Thus, one of the issues inherent in metaethics concerns its status vis-à-vis other levels of moral philosophizing.

As a historical fact, metaethical positions have been combined with a variety of first-order moral positions, and vice versa: George Berkeley, John Stuart Mill, G.E. Moore, and R.M. Hare, for instance, were all committed to some form of Utilitarianism as a first-order moral framework, despite advocating radically different metaethical positions. Likewise, in his influential book Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, J.L. Mackie (1977) defends a form of (second-order) metaethical skepticism or relativism in the first chapter, only to devote the rest of the book to the articulation of a substantive theory of (first-order) Utilitarianism. Metaethical positions would appear then to underdetermine normative theories, perhaps in the same way that normative theories themselves underdetermine applied ethical stances (for example, two equally committed Utilitarians can nonetheless disagree about the moral permissibility of eating meat). Yet, despite the logically possible combinations of second and first-order moral positions, Stephen Darwall (2006: 25) notes that, nevertheless, “there do seem to be affinities between metaethical and roughly corresponding ethical theories,” for example, metaethical naturalists have almost universally tended to be Utilitarians at the first-order level, though not vice versa. Notable exceptions to this tendency—that is, metaethical naturalists who are also first-order deontologists—include Alan Gewirth (1977) and Michael Boylan (1999; 2004). For critical responses to these positions, see Beyleveld (1992), Steigleder (1999), Spence (2006), and Gordon (2009).

Other philosophers envision the connection between metaethics and more concrete moral theorizing in much more intimate ways. For example, Matthew Kramer (2009: 2) has argued that metaethical realism (see section four below) is itself actually a first-order moral view as well, noting that “most of the reasons for insisting on the objectivity of ethics are ethical reasons.” (For a similar view about the first-order “need” to believe in the second-order thesis that moral values are “objective,” see also Ronald Dworkin 1996.) Torbjörn Tännsjö (1990), by contrast, argues that, although metaethics is irrelevant to normative theorizing, it may still be significant in other psychological or pragmatic way, for example, by constraining other beliefs. Nicholas Sturgeon (1986) has claimed that the first-order belief in moral fallibility must be grounded in some second-order metaethical view. And David Wiggins (1976) has suggested that metaethical questions about the ultimate foundation and justification of basic moral beliefs may have deep existential implications for how humans view the question of the meaning of life.

The metaethical question of whether or not moral values are cross-culturally universal would seem to have important implications for how foreign practices are morally evaluated at the first-order level. In particular, metaethical relativism (the view that there are no universal or objective moral values) has been viewed as highly loaded politically and psychologically. Proponents of such relativism often appeal to the alleged open-mindedness and tolerance about first-order moral differences that their second-order metaethical view would seem to support. Conversely, opponents of relativism often appeal to what Thomas Scanlon (1995) has called a “fear of relativism,” citing an anxiety about the first-order effects on our moral convictions and motivations if we become too morally tolerant. (See sections five and eight below for a more detailed discussion of the psychological and political dimensions of metaethics, respectively.) Russ Shafer-Landau (2004) further draws attention to the first-order rhetorical uses of metaethics, for example, Rudolph Giuliani’s evocation of the dangers of metaethical relativism following the terrorist events in the United States on September 11, 2001.

3. Semantic Issues in Metaethics

a. Cognitivism versus Non-Cognitivism

One of the central debates within analytic metaethics concerns the semantics of what is actually going on when people make moral statements such as “Abortion is morally wrong” or “Going to war is never morally justified.” The metaethical question is not necessarily whether such statements themselves are true or false, but whether they are even the sort of sentences that are capable of being true or false in the first place (that is, whether such sentences are “truth-apt”) and, if they are, what it is that makes them “true.”  On the surface, such sentences would appear to possess descriptive content—that is, they seem to have the syntactical structure of describing facts in the world—in the same form that the sentence “The cat is on the mat” seems to be making a descriptive claim about a cat on a mat; which, in turn, is true or false depending on whether or not there really is a cat on the mat. To put it differently, the sentence “The cat is on the mat” seems to be expressing a belief about the way the world actually is. The metaethical view that moral statements similarly express truth-apt beliefs about the world is known as cognitivism. Cognitivism would seem to be the default view of our moral discourse given the apparent structure that such discourse appears to have. Indeed, if cognitivism were not true— such that moral sentences were expressing something other than truth-apt propositions—then it would seem to be difficult to account for why we nonetheless are able to make logical inferences from one moral sentence to another. For instance, consider the following argument:

1. It is wrong to lie.

2. If it is wrong to lie, then it is wrong to get one’s sibling to lie.

3. Therefore, it is wrong to get one’s sibling to lie.

This argument seems to be a valid application of the logical rule known as modus ponens. Yet, logical rules such as modus ponens operate only on truth-apt propositions. Thus, because we seem to be able to legitimately apply such a rule in the example above, such moral sentences must be truth-apt. This argument in favor of metaethical cognitivism by appeal to the apparent logical structure of moral discourse is known as the Frege-Geach Problem in honor of the philosophers credited with its articulation (compare, Geach 1960; Geach 1965 credits Frege as an ancestor of this problem; see also Schueler 1988 for an influential analysis of this problem vis-à-vis moral realism). According to proponents of the Frege-Geach Problem, rejecting cognitivism would force us to show the separate occurrences of the sentence “it is wrong to lie” in the above argument as homonymous: according to such non-cognitivists, the occurrence in sentence (1) is an expression of a non-truth-apt sentiment about lying, whereas the occurrence in sentence (2) is not, since it’s only claiming what one would express conditionally. Since this homonymy would seem to threaten to undermine the grammatical structure of moral discourse, non-cognitivism must be rejected.

Despite this argument about the surface appearance of cognitivism, however, numerous metaethicists have rejected the view that moral sentences ultimately express beliefs about the world. A historically influential forerunner of the alternate theory of non-cognitivism can be found in the moral writings of David Hume, who famously argued that moral distinctions are not derived from reason, but instead represent emotional responses. As such, moral sentences express not beliefs which may be true or false, but desires or feelings which are neither true nor false. This Humean position was renewed in twentieth-century metaethics by the observation that not only are moral disputes often heavily affect-laden in a way many other factual disputes are not, but also that the kind of facts which would apparently be necessary to accommodate true moral beliefs would have to be very strange sorts of entities. Specifically, the worry is that, whereas we can appeal to standards of empirical verification or falsification to adjudicate when our non-moral beliefs are true or false, no such standards seem applicable in the moral sphere, since we cannot literally point to moral goodness in the way we can literally point to cats on mats.

In response to this apparent disanalogy between moral and non-moral statements, many metaethicists embraced a sort of neo-Humean non-cognitivism, according to which moral statements express non-truth-apt desires or feelings. The Logical Positivism of the Vienna Circle adopted this metaethical position, finding anything not empirically verifiable to be semantically “meaningless.” Thus, A.J. Ayer (1936) defended what he called metaethical emotivism, according to which moral expressions are indexed always to the speaker’s own affective state. So, the moral utterance “Abortion is morally wrong” would ultimately mean only that “I do not approve of abortion,” or, more accurately (to avoid even the appearance of having descriptive content), “Abortion—boo!” C.L. Stevenson (1944) further developed metaethical non-cognitivism as involving not merely an expression of the speaker’s personal attitude, but also an implicit endorsement of what the speaker thinks the audience ought to feel. R.M. Hare (1982) similarly analyzed moral utterances as containing both descriptive (truth-apt) as well as ineliminably prescriptive elements, such that genuinely asserting, for instance, that murder is wrong involves a concomitant emotional endorsement of not murdering. Drawing on the work of ordinary-language philosophers such as J.L. Austin, Hare distinguished the act of making a statement (that is, the statement’s “illocutionary force”) from other acts that may be performed concomitantly (that is, the statement’s “perlocutionary force”)— as when, for example, stating “I do” in the context of a marriage ceremony thereby effects an actual legal reality. Similarly, Hare argued that in the case of moral language, the illocutionary act of describing a war as “unjust” may, as part and parcel of the description itself, also involve the perlocutionary force of recommending a negative attitude or action with respect to that war. For Hare, the prescriptive dimension of such an assertion must be constrained by the requirements of universalizability—hence, Hare’s metaethical position is referred to as “universal prescriptivism.”

More recently, sophisticated versions of non-cognitivism have flourished that build into moral expression not only the individual speaker’s normative endorsement, but also an appeal to a socially-shared norm that helps contextualize the endorsement. Thus, Alan Gibbard (1990) defends norm-expressivism, according to which moral statements express commitments not to idiosyncratic personal feelings, but instead to the particular (and, for Gibbard, evolutionarily adaptive) cultural mores that enable communication and social coordination.

Non-cognitivists have also attempted to address the Frege-Geach Problem discussed above, by specifying how the expression of attitudes functions in moral discourse. Simon Blackburn (1984), for instance, has famously argued that non-cognitivism is a claim only about the moral, not the logical parts of discourse. Thus, according to Blackburn, to say that “If it is wrong to lie, then it is wrong to get one’s sibling to lie” can be understood as expressing not an attitude toward lying itself (which is couched in merely hypothetical terms), but rather an attitude toward the disposition to express an attitude toward lying (that is, a kind of second-order sentiment). Since this still essentially involves the expression of attitudes rather than truth-apt assertions, it’s still properly a type of non-cognitivism; yet, by distinguishing expressing an attitude directly from expressing an attitude about another (hypothetical) attitude, Blackburn thinks the logical and grammatical structure of our discourse is preserved. Since this view combines the expressive thesis of non-cognitivism with the logical appearance of moral realism, Blackburn dubs it “quasi-realism”. For a critical response to Blackburn’s attempted solution to the Frege-Geach Problem, see Wright (1988). For an accessible survey of the history of the debate surrounding the Frege-Geach Problem, see Schroeder (2008), and for attempts to articulate new hybrid theories that combine elements of both cognitivism as well as non-cognitivism, see Ridge (2006) and Boisvert (2008).

One complication in the ongoing debate between cognitivist versus non-cognitivist accounts of moral language is the growing realization of the difficulty in conceptually distinguishing beliefs from desires in the first place. Recognition of the mingled nature of cognitive and non-cognitive states can arguably be found in Aristotle’s view that how we perceive and conceptualize a situation fundamentally affects how we respond to it emotionally; not to mention Sigmund Freud’s commitment to the idea that our emotions themselves stem ultimately from (perhaps unconscious) beliefs (compare, Neu 2000). Much contemporary metaethical debate between cognitivists and non-cognitivists thus concerns the extent to which beliefs alone, desires alone, or some compound of the two—what J.E.J. Altham (1986) has dubbed “besires”—are capable of capturing the prescriptive and affective dimension that moral discourse seems to evidence (see Theories of Emotions).

b. Theories of Moral Truth

A related issue regarding the semantics of metaethics concerns what it would even mean to say that a moral statement is “true” if some form of cognitivism were correct. The traditional philosophical account of truth (called the correspondence theory of truth) regards a proposition as true just in case it accurately describes the way the world really is independent of the proposition. Thus, the sentence “The cat is on the mat” would be true if and only if there really is a cat who is really on a mat. According to this understanding, moral expressions would similarly have to correspond to external features about the world in order to be true: the sentence “Murder is wrong” would be true in virtue of its correspondence to some “fact” in the world about murder being wrong. And indeed, several metaethical positions (often grouped under the title of “realism” or “objectivism”—see section four below) embrace precisely this view; although exactly what the features of the world are to which allegedly true moral propositions correspond remains a matter of serious debate. However, there are several obvious challenges to this traditional correspondence account of moral truth. For one thing, moral properties such as “wrongness” do not seem to be the sort of entities that can literally be pointed to or picked out by propositions in the same way that cats and mats can be, since the moral properties are not spatial-temporal objects. As David Hume famously put it,

Take any action allow’d to be vicious: Wilful murder, for instance. Examine it in all lights, and see if you can find that matter of fact, or real existence, which you call vice. In which-ever way you take it, you find only certain passions, motives, volitions and thoughts. There is no other matter of fact in the case. (Hume 1740: 468)

Other possible ontological models for what moral “facts” might look like are considered in section four below. In later years, however, several alternative philosophical understandings of truth have proliferated which might allow moral expressions to be “true” without requiring any correspondence to external facts per se. Many of these new theories of moral truth hearken to a suggestion by Ludwig Wittgenstein in the early twentieth-century that the meaning of any term is determined by how that term is actually used in discourse. Building on this insight about meaning, Frank Ramsey (1927) extended the account to truth itself. Thus, according to Ramsey, the predicate “is true” does not stand for a property per se, but rather functions as a kind of abbreviation for the indirect assertion of other propositions. For instance, Ramsey suggested that to utter the proposition “The cat is on the mat” is to say the same thing as “The sentence ‘the cat is on the mat’ is true.” The phrase “is true” in the latter utterance adds nothing semantically to what is expressed in the former, since in uttering the former, the speaker is already affirming that the cat is on the mat. This is an instance of the so-called disquotational schema, that is, the view that truth is already implicit in a sentence without the addition of the phrase “is true.” Ramsey wielded this principle to defend a deflationary theory of truth, wherein truth predicates are stripped of any metaphysically substantial property, and reduced instead merely to the ability to be formally represented in a language. Saying that truth is thus stripped of metaphysics is not to say that it is determined by usage in an arbitrary or unprincipled way. This is because, while the deflationary theory defines “truth” merely as the ability to be represented in a language, there are always syntactic rules that a language must follow. The grammar of a language thus constrains what can be properly expressed in that language, and therefore (on the deflationary theory) what can be true. Deflationary truth is in this way constrained by what may be called “warranted assertibility,” and since deflationary truth just is what can be expressed by the grammar of a language, we can say more strongly that truth is warranted assertibility.

Hilary Putnam (1981) has articulated an influential challenge to the deflationary account. He argues that deflationary truth is unable to accommodate the fact that we normally think of truth as eternal and stable. But if truth just is warranted assertibility (or what Putnam calls “rational acceptability”), then it becomes mutable since warranted assertibility varies depending on what information is available. For instance, the proposition “the Earth is flat” could have been asserted with warrant (that is, accepted rationally) a thousand years ago in a way that it could not be today because we now have more information available about the Earth. But, though warranted assertibility changed in this case, we wouldn’t want to say that the truth of the proposition “the Earth is flat” changed. Based on these problems, philosophers like Putnam refine the deflationary theory by substituting a condition of ideal warrant or justification, that is, where warranted assertibility is not relative to what specific information a speaker may have at a specific moment, but to what information would be accessible to an ideal epistemic agent. What kind of information would such an ideal speaker have? Putnam characterizes the ideal epistemic situation as involving information that is both complete (that is, involving everything relevant) and consistent (that is, not logically contradictory). These two conditions combine to affect a convergence of information for the ideal agent— a view Putnam calls “internal realism.”

This tradition of deflating truth—of what Jamie Dreier has described as “sucking the substance out of heavy-duty metaphysical concepts” (Dreier 2004: 26)—has received careful exposition in recent years by Crispin Wright. Wright (1992) defends a theory of truth he calls “minimalism.” Though indebted in fundamental ways to the tradition—from Wittgenstein to Ramsey to Putnam—discussed above, Wright’s position differs importantly from these accounts. Wright agrees with Putnam’s criticism of traditional deflationary theories of truth, namely that they make truth too variable by identifying it with something as mutable as warranted assertibility. However, Wright disagrees with Putnam that truth is constrained by the convergence of information that would be available to an epistemically ideal agent. This is because Wright thinks that it is apparent to speakers of a language that something may be true even if it is not justified in ideal epistemic conditions. Wright calls this apparentness a “platitude.” Platitudes, says Wright, are what ordinary language users pre-theoretically mean, and Wright identifies several specific platitudes we have concerning truth, for example, that a statement can be true without being justified, that truth-apt propositions have negations that are also thereby truth-apt, and so forth. Such platitudes serve the same purpose of checking and balancing truth that warranted assertibility or ideal convergence served in the theories of Ramsey and Putnam (Wright calls this check and balance “superassertability”). As Wright puts it, “If an interpretation of “true” satisfies these platitudes, there is, for minimalism, no further, metaphysical question whether it captures a concept worth regarding as truth” (1992: 34). Wright’s theory of minimalist truth has been extraordinarily influential in metaethics, particularly by non-cognitivists eager to accommodate some of the logical structure that moral discourse apparently evidences, but without viewing moral utterances as expressing beliefs that must literally correspond to facts. Such a non-cognitivist theory of minimalist moral truth is defended by Simon Blackburn (1993), who characterizes the resultant view as “quasi-realism” (as discussed in section 3a above). For a critical discussion of the extent to which non-cognitivist views such as Blackburn’s quasi-realism can leverage Wright’s theory of minimalism, see the debate between Michael Smith (1994) and John Divers and Alexander Miller (1994).

4. Ontological Issues in Metaethics

a. Moral Realisms

If moral truth is understood in the traditional sense of corresponding to reality, what sort of features of reality could suffice to accommodate this correspondence? What sort of entity is “wrongness” or “goodness” in the first place? The branch of philosophy that deals with the way in which things exist is called “ontology”, and metaethical positions may also be divided according to how they envision the ontological status of moral values. Perhaps the biggest schism within metaethics is between those who claim that there are moral facts that are “real” or “objective” in the sense that they exist independently of any beliefs or evidence about them, versus those who think that moral values are not belief-independent “facts” at all, but are instead created by individuals or cultures in sometimes radically different ways. Proponents of the former view are called realists or objectivists; proponents of the latter view are called relativists or subjectivists.

Realism / objectivism is often defended by appeal to the normative or political implications of believing that there are universal moral truths that transcend what any individual or even an entire culture might think about them (see sections two and eight). Realist positions, however, disagree about what precisely moral values are if they are causally independent from human belief or culture. According to some realists, moral values are abstract properties that are “objective” in the same sense that geometrical or mathematical properties might be thought to be objective. For example, it might be thought that the sentence “Dogs are canines” is true in a way that is independent from what humans think about it, without thereby believing that there is a literal, physical thing called “dogs”— for, dogs-in-general (rather than a particular dog, say, Fido) is an abstract concept. Some moral realists envision moral values as real without being physical in precisely this way; and because of the similarity between this view and Plato’s famous Theory of Forms, such moral realists are also sometimes called moral Platonists. According to such realists, moral values are real without being reducible to any other kinds of properties or facts: moral values instead, according to these realists, are ontologically unique (or sui generis) and irreducible to other kinds of properties. Proponents of this type of Platonist or sui generis version of moral realism include G.E. Moore (1903), W.D. Ross (1930), W.D. Hudson (1967), Iris Murdoch (1970, arguably), and Russ Shafer-Landau (2003). Tom Regan (1986) also discusses the effect of this metaethical position on the general intellectual climate of the fin de siècle movement known as the Bloomsbury Group.

Other moral realists, though, conceive of the ontology of moral properties in much more concrete terms. According to these realists, moral properties such as “goodness” are not purely abstract entities, but are always instead realized and embodied in particular physical states of affairs. These moral realists often draw analogies between moral properties and scientific properties such as gravity, velocity, mass, and so forth. These scientific concepts are commonly thought to exist independent of what we think about them, and yet they are not part of an ontologically distinct world of pure, abstract ideas in the way that Plato envisioned. So too might moral properties ultimately be reducible to scientific features of the world in a way that preserves their objectivity. An early proponent of such a naturalistic view is arguably Aristotle himself, who anchored his ethics to an understanding of what biologically makes human life flourish. For a later Aristotelian moral realism, see Paul Bloomfield (2001). However, for questions about the extent to which Aristotelianism can truly pair with moral realism, see Robert Heinaman (1995). Note also that several other metaethicists who share broadly Aristotelian conceptions of human needs and human flourishing nonetheless reject realism, arguing that even a shared human nature still essentially locates moral values in human sensibility rather than in some trans-human moral reality. For examples of such naturalistic moral relativism, see Philippa Foot (2001) and David B. Wong (2006). Similar claims about the ineliminable roles that human sensibility and language play in constituting moral reality have looked less to Aristotle and more to Wittgenstein; although, as with the former, there may be some discomfort allowing views that closely link morality with human sensibilities to be called genuinely “realist.” For examples, see in particular David Wiggins (1976) and Sabina Lovibond (1983). Other notable theorists who have advanced Wittgensteinian accounts of the constitutive role that language and context play in our understanding of morality include G.E.M. Anscombe (1958) and Alasdair MacIntyre (1981), although both are explicitly agnostic about whether this commits them to moral realism or relativism.

The naturalistic tradition of moral realism is continued by contemporary theorists such as Alan Gewirth (1980), Deryck Beyleveld (1992), and Michael Boylan (2004) who similarly seek to ground moral objectivity in certain universal features of humans. Unlike Aristotelian appeals to our biological and social nature, however, these theorists adopt a Kantian stance, which appeals to the capacities and requirements of rational agency—for example, what Gewirth has called “the principle of generic consistency.” While these neo-Kantian theories are more focused on questions about the justification of moral beliefs rather than on the existence of belief-independent values or properties, they may nonetheless be classed as moral realisms in light of their commitment to the objective and universal nature of rationality. For commentary and discussion of such theories, see in particular Steigleder (1999), Boylan (1999), Spence (2006), and Gordon (2009).

Other naturalistic theories have looked to scientific models of property reductionism as a way of understanding moral realism. In the same way that, for instance, our commonsense understanding of “water” refers to a property that, at the scientific level, just is H2O, so too might moral values be reduced to non-moral properties. And, since these non-moral properties are real entities, the resultant view about the values that reduce to them can be considered a form of moral realism—without any need to posit trans-scientific, other-worldly Platonic entities. This general approach to naturalistic realism is often referred to as “Cornell Realism” in light of the fact that several of its prominent advocates studied or taught at Cornell University. Geoff Sayre-McCord (1988) has also famously dubbed it “New Wave Moral Realism.” Individual proponents of such a view may have divergent views concerning how the alleged “reduction” of the moral to the non-moral works precisely. Richard Boyd (1988), for instance, defends the view that the reductive relationship between moral and non-moral properties is a priori and necessary, but not thereby singular; moral properties might instead reduce to a “homeostatic cluster” of different overlapping non-moral properties.

Several other notable examples of scientifically-minded naturalistic moral realism have been defended. Nicholas Sturgeon (1988) has similarly argued in favor of a reduction of moral to non-moral properties, while emphasizing that a reduction at the level of the denotation or extension of our moral terms need not entail a corresponding reduction at the level of the connotation or intension of how we talk about morality. In other words, we can affirm that values just are (sets of) natural properties without thereby thinking we can or should abandon our moral language or explanatory/justificatory processes. David Brink (1989) has articulated a similar type of naturalistic moral realism which emphasizes the epistemological and motivational aspects of Cornell Realism by defending a coherentist account of justification and an externalist theory of motivation, respectively. Peter Railton (1986) has also offered a version of naturalistic moral realism according to which moral properties are reduced to non-moral properties; however, the non-moral properties in question are not so much scientific properties (or clusters of such properties), but are instead constituted by the “objective interests” of ideal epistemic agents or “impartial spectators.” Yet another variety of naturalistic moral realism has been put forward by Frank Jackson and Philip Pettit (1995). According to their view of “analytic moral functionalism,” moral properties are reducible to “whatever plays their role in mature folk morality.” Jackson’s (1998) refinement of this position—which he calls “analytic descriptivism”—elaborates that the “mature folk” properties to which moral properties are reducible will be “descriptive predicates” (although Jackson allows for the possibility that these descriptive predicates need not be physical or even scientific).

A helpful way to understand the differences between all these varieties of moral realism—namely, the Platonic versus the naturalistic versions— is by appeal to a famous argument advanced by G.E. Moore at the beginning of twentieth-century metaethics. Moore—himself an advocate of the Platonic view of morality—argued that moral properties such as “good” cannot be solely defined by scientific, natural properties such as “biological flourishing” or “social coordination” for the simple reason that, given such an alleged definition, we could still always sensibly ask whether such scientific properties were themselves truly good or not. The apparent ability to always keep the moral status of any scientific or natural thing an “open question” led Moore to reject any analysis of morality that defined moral values as anything other than simply “moral,” period. Any attempt to violate this ban must result, Moore believed, in the committing of a “naturalistic fallacy.” Moral Platonists or non-naturalistic realists tend to view Moore’s Open Question Argument as persuasive. Naturalistic realists, by contrast, argue that Moore’s argument is unconvincing on the grounds that not all truths— moral or otherwise— necessarily need to be true solely by definition. After all, such realists will argue, scientific statements such as “Water is H2O” is true even though people can (and did for a long time) question this definition.

Michael Smith (1994) has referred to this realist strategy of defining moral properties as naturalistic properties which humans discover, rather than which are simply true by definition, as “synthetic ethical naturalism.” One argument against this form of moral realism has been developed by Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons (1991), on the basis of a thought-experiment called Moral Twin Earth. This thought-experiment asks us to imagine two different worlds, the actual Earth as we know it and an alternate-reality Earth in which the same moral terms as those on the actual Earth are used to refer to the same natural/scientific properties (as the naturalistic moral realist wants to say). However, Horgan and Timmons point out that we can at the same time imagine that the moral terms on our actual Earth refer to, say, properties that maximize overall happiness (as Utilitarianism maintains), while also imagining that the moral terms used on hypothetical Moral Twin Earth refer to properties of universal rationality (as Kantian normative theorists maintain). But this would show that the moral terms used on actual Earth versus those used on Moral Twin Earth have different meanings, because they refer to different normative theories. This implies that it would be the normative theories themselves that are causing the difference in the meaning of the moral terms, not the natural properties since those are identical across the two worlds. And since naturalistic (a.k.a. Cornell) moral realism maintains that moral properties are identical at some level to natural properties, Horgan and Timmons think this thought-experiment disproves naturalistic realism. In other words, if the naturalistic realists were correct about the reduction of moral to non-moral predicates, then the Earthlings and Twin Earthlings would have to be interpreted not as genuinely disagreeing about morality, but as instead talking past one another altogether; and, according to Horgan and Timmons, this would be highly counter-intuitive, since it seems on the surface that the two parties are truly disagreeing.

Centrally at issue in the Moral Twin Earth argument is the question of how precisely naturalistic realists envision moral properties being “reduced” to natural, scientific properties in the first place. Such realists frequently invoke the metaphysical relationship of supervenience to account for the way that moral properties might connect to scientific properties. For one property or set of properties to supervene on another means that any change in one must necessarily result in a corresponding change in the other. For instance, to say that the color property of greenness supervenes on grass is to say that if two plots of grass are identical in all biological, scientific ways, then they will be green in exactly the same way too. Simon Blackburn (1993: 111-129), however, has raised a serious objection to using this notion to explain moral supervenience. Blackburn claims that if moral properties did supervene on natural properties, then we should be able to imagine two different worlds (akin to Horgan and Timmons’ Moral Twin Earth) where killing is morally wrong in one world, but not wrong in the other world— all we would have to do is imagine two worlds in which the natural, scientific facts were different. And if we can coherently imagine these two worlds, then there is no reason why we should not also be able to imagine a third “mixed” world in which killing is sometimes wrong and sometimes not. But Blackburn does not think we can in fact imagine such a strange morally mixed world— for, he believes that it is part of our conception of morality that moral wrongness or rightness does not just change haphazardly from case to case, all things being equal. As Blackburn says, “While I cannot see an inconsistency in holding this belief [namely, the view that moral propositions report factual states of affairs upon which the moral properties supervene in an irreducible way], it is not philosophically very inviting. Supervenience becomes, for the realist, an opaque, isolated, logical fact for which no explanation can be proffered” (1993: 119). In this way, Blackburn is not objecting to the supervenience relation per se, but rather to attempts to leverage this relation in favor of moral realism. For a critical examination of supervenience in principle, see Kim (1990); Blackburn attempts to refurbish his notion of supervenience in response to Kim’s critique in Blackburn (1993: 130-148).

Apart from the debate between naturalistic versus non-naturalistic moral realists, some metaethicists have explored the possibility that moral properties might be “real” without needing to be fully independent from human sensibility. According to these theories of moral realism, moral values might be akin to so-called “dispositional properties.” A dispositional property (sometimes understood as a “secondary quality”) is envisioned as a sort of latent potential or disposition, inherent in some external object or state of affairs, that becomes activated or actualized through involvement on the part of some other object or state of affairs. Thus, for example, the properties of being fragile or looking red are thought to involve a latent disposition to break under certain conditions or to appear red in a certain light. The suggestion that moral values might be similarly dispositional was made famous by John McDowell (1985). According to this view, moral properties such as “goodness” can still be real at the level of dispositional possibility (in the same way that glass is still fragile even when it is not breaking, or that blood is red even in the darkness), while still only being expressible by reference to the features (actual moral agents, in the case of morality) that would actualize those dispositions. For similar metaethical positions that seek to articulate a model of moral values which are objective, yet relational to aspects of human sensibility, see David Wiggins (1976), Sabina Lovibond (1983), David McNaughton (1988), Mark Platts (1991), Jonathan Dancy (2000), and DeLapp (2009). Arguments against this form of dispositional moral realism typically attempt to leverage alleged disanalogies between moral properties and other, non-moral dispositional properties (see especially Blackburn 1993).

b. Moral Relativisms

Other metaethical positions reject altogether the idea that moral values— whether naturalistic, non-naturalistic, or dispositional—are real or objective in the sense of being independent from human belief or culture in the first place. Such positions instead insist on the fundamentally anthropocentric nature of morality. According to such views, moral values are not “out there” in the world (whether as scientific properties, dispositional properties, or Platonic Forms) at all, but are created by human perspectives and needs. Since these perspectives and needs can vary from person to person or from culture to culture, these metaethical theories are usually referred to as either “subjectivism” or “relativism” (sometimes moral nihilism as well; although, this is a more normatively loaded term). Many of the reasons in favor of metaethical relativism concern either a rejection of the realist ontological models discussed above, or else by appeal to psychological, epistemological, or anthropological considerations (see sections 5, 6, 7 below).

Most forms of metaethical relativism envision moral values as constructed for different, and sometimes incommensurable human purposes such as social coordination, and so forth. This view is explicitly endorsed by Gilbert Harman (1975), but may also be implicitly associated in different ways with any position that conceives of moral value as constructed by divine commands (Adams 1987; see also Divine Command Theory), idealized human rationality (Korsgaard 1996) or perspective (Firth 1952), or a social contract between competing interests (Scanlon 1982; Copp 2007). For this reason, the view is also sometimes known as moral constructivism (compare, Shafer-Landau 2003: 39-52). Furthermore, metaethical relativism must be distinguished from the non-cognitivist metaethical views considered above in section three. Non-cognitivism is a semantic thesis about what moral utterances mean—namely, that moral utterances are neither true nor false at all, but instead express prescriptive endorsements or norms. Metaethical subjectivism/relativism/constructivism, by contrast, acknowledges the semantic accuracy of cognitivism—according to which moral utterances are either true or false— but insists that such utterances are always, as it happens, false. That is, metaethical subjectivism/relativism/constructivism is a thesis about the (lack of) moral facts in the world, not a thesis about what we humans are doing when we try to talk about such facts. And since metaethical subjectivism/relativism/constructivism thinks that our cognitivist moral language is systematically false, it may also be known as moral error theory (Mackie 1977) or moral fictionalism (Kalderon 2005).

Although metaethical relativism is often depicted as embracing a valueless world of moral free-for-all, more sophisticated versions of the theory have attempted to place certain boundaries on morality in a way that still affirms the fundamental human-centeredness of values. Thus, David B. Wong (1984; 2006) has defended a view he calls pluralistic moral relativism according to which moral values are constructed differently by different social groups for different purposes; but in such a way that the degree of relativity will be nonetheless constrained by a generally uniform biological account of human nature and flourishing. A similar conception of metaethical relativism that is nonetheless grounded in some notion of universal human biological characteristics may be found in Philippa Foot (2001).

5. Psychology and Metaethics

One of the most pressing questions within analytic metaethics concerns how morality engages our embodied human psychologies. Specifically, how (if at all) do moral judgments move us to act in accordance with them? Is there any reason to be moral for its own sake, and can we give any psychologically persuasive reasons to others to act morally if they do not already acknowledge such reasons? Is it part of the definition of moral concepts such as “right” and “wrong” that they should or should not be pursued, or is it possible to know that, say, murder is morally wrong, but nonetheless not recognize any reason not to murder?

a. Motivation and Moral Reasons

Those who argue that the psychological motivation to act morally is already implicit in the judgment that something is morally good, are commonly called motivational internalists. Motivational internalists may further be divided into weak motivational internalists or strong motivational internalists, according to the strength of the motivation that they think true moral judgments come pre-packaged with. Thus, the Socratic view that evil is always performed out of ignorance (for no one, goes the argument, would knowingly do something that would morally damage their own character or soul) may be seen as a type of strong motivational internalism. Weaker versions of motivational internalism may insist only that moral judgments supply their own impetus to act accordingly, but that this impetus can (and perhaps often does) get overruled by countervailing motivational forces. Thus, Aristotle’s famous account of “weakness of the will” has been interpreted as a weaker sort of motivational internalism, according to which a person may recognize that something is morally right, and may even want at some level to do what is right, but is nonetheless lured away from such action, perhaps through stronger temptations.

Apart from what actually motivates people to act in accordance with their moral judgments, however, there is the somewhat different question about whether such judgments also supply their own intrinsic reasons to act in accordance with them. Reasons-externalists assert that sincerely judging that something is morally wrong, for instance, automatically supplies a reason for the judger that would justify her acting on the basis of that judgment, that is, a reason that is external to or independent of what the judger herself feels or wants. This need not mean that such a justification is an objectively adequate justification (that would hinge on whether one was a realist or relativist about metaethics), only that it would make sense as a response to the question “Why did you do that?” to say “Because I judged that it was morally right” (compare, McDowell 1978; Shafer-Landau 2003). According to reasons-internalists, however, judging and justifying are two conceptually different matters, such that someone could make a legitimate judgment that an action was morally wrong and still fail to recognize any reason that would justify their not performing it. Instead, sufficiently justifying moral reasons must exist independently and internally to a person’s psychological makeup (compare, Foot 1972; Williams 1979).

Closely related to the debates between internalism and externalism is the question of the metaethical status of alleged psychopaths or sociopaths. According to some moral psychologists, such individuals are characterized by a failure to distinguish moral values from merely conventional values. Several metaethicists have pointed to the apparent existence of psychopaths as support for the truth of either motivational or reasons-externalism; since psychopaths seem to be able to judge that, for instance, murder or lying are morally wrong, but either feel little or no motivation to refrain from these things, or else do not recognize any reason that should justify refraining from these things. Motivational internalists and reasons-externalists, however, have also sought to accommodate the challenge presented by the psychopath, for example, by arguing that the psychopath does not truly, robustly know that what she is doing is wrong, but only knows how to use the word “wrong” in roughly the way that the rest of society does.

A separate issue related to the internalist/externalist debate concerns the apparent psychological uniqueness of moral judgments. Specifically, at least according to the motivational internalist and reasons-externalist, moral judgments are supposed to supply, respectively, their own inherent motivations or justifying reasons, that is, their own intrinsic quality of “to-be-pursuedness.” Yet, this would seem to render morality suspiciously unique—or what J.L. Mackie (1977) calls “metaphysically queer”— since all other, non-moral judgments (for example, scientific, factual, or perceptual judgments) do not seem to provide any inherent motivations or justifications. The objection is not that non-moral judgments (for example, “This coffee is decaffeinated”) supply no motivational or justificatory force, but merely that any such motivation or justificatory force hinges on other psychological factors independent of the judgment itself (that is, the judgment about the coffee being decaffeinated will only motivate or provide a reason for you to drink it if you already have the desire to avoid caffeine). Unlike the factual judgment about the coffee, though, the moral judgment that an action is wrong is supposed to be motivating or reasons-giving regardless of the judger’s personal desires or interests. Motivational internalists or reasons-externalists have responded to this alleged “queerness” by either embracing the uniqueness of moral judgments, or else by attempting to articulate other examples of non-moral judgments which might also inherently supply motivation or reasons.

b. Experimental Metaethics

Not only has psychology been of interest to metaethicists, but metaethics has also been of interest to psychologists. The movement known as experimental philosophy (compare, Appiah 2008; Knobe and Nichols 2008)— which seeks to supplement theoretical philosophical claims with empirical attention to how people actually think and act— has yielded numerous suggestive findings about a variety of metaethical positions. For example, drawing on empirical research in social psychology, several philosophers have suggested that moral judgments, motivations, and evaluations are highly sensitive to situational variables in a way that might challenge the universality or autonomy of morality (Flanagan 1991; Doris 2002). Other moral psychologists have explored the possibilities of divergences in moral reasoning and valuation with respect to gender (Gilligan 1982), ethnicity (Markus and Kitayama 1991; Miller and Bersoff 1992), and political affiliation (McCrae 1992; Haidt 2007).

The specific debate between metaethical realism and relativism has also recently been examined from experimental perspectives. It has been argued that an empirically-informed analysis of people’s actual metaethical commitments (such as they are) is needed as a check and balance on the many frequent appeals to “commonsense morality” or “ordinary moral experience.” Realists as well as relativists have often used such appeals as a means of locating a burden of proof for or against their theories, but the actual experimental findings about lay-people’s metaethical intuitions remain mixed. For examples of realists assuming folk realism, see Brink (1989: 25), Smith (1994: 5), and Shafer-Landau (2003: 23); for examples of relativists assuming folk relativism, see Harman (1985); and for examples of relativists assuming folk realism, see Mackie (1977) and Joyce (2001: 70). William James (1896: 14) offered an early psychological description of humans as “absolutists by instinct,” although James’ specific metaethical commitments remain unclear (compare, Suckiel 1982). On the one hand, Shaun Nichols (2004) has argued that metaethical relativism is particularly pronounced among college undergraduates. On the other hand, William Rottschaefer (1999) has argued instead that moral realism is empirically supported by attention to effective child-rearing practices.

c. Moral Emotions

Another psychological topic that has been of interest to metaethicists is the nature and significance of moral emotions. One aspect of this debate has been the perennial question of whether it is fundamentally rationality which supplies our moral distinctions and motivations, or whether these are instead generated or conditioned by passions and sentiments which are separate from reason. (See section 5a above for more on this debate.) In particular, this debate was one of the dividing issues in eighteenth-century ethics between the so-called Intellectualist School (for example, Ralph Cudworth, William Wollaston, and so forth), which stressed the rational grasp of certain “moral fitnesses” on the one hand, and the Sentimentalist School (for example, Shaftesbury, David Hume, and so forth), which stressed the role played by our non-cognitive “moral sense” on the other hand (compare, Selby-Bigge 1897; see also Darwall 1995 for an application of these views to contemporary metaethical debates about moral motivation and knowledge).

Aside from motivational and epistemological issues, however, moral emotions have been of interest to metaethicists in terms of the apparent phenomenology they furnish. In particular, attention has been given to which metaethical theory, if any, better accommodates the existence of self-regarding “retributive emotions,” such as guilt, regret, shame, and remorse. Martha Nussbaum (1986) and Bernard Williams (1993), for example, have drawn compelling attention to the powerful emotional responses characteristic of Greek tragedy, and the so-called moral luck that such experiences seem to involve. According to Williams (1965), sensitivity to moral dilemmas will reveal a picture of the moral sphere according to which even the best-intentioned actions may leave moral “stains” or “remainders” on our character. Michael Stocker (1990) extends this analysis of moral emotions to more general scenarios of ineliminable conflicts between values, and Kevin DeLapp (2009) explores the specific implications of tragic emotions for theories of moral realism. By contrast, Gilbert Harman (2009) has argued against the moral (let alone metaethical) significance of guilt feelings. Patricia Greenspan (1995), however, has leveraged the phenomenology of guilt (particularly as she identifies it in cases of unavoidable wrong-doing) as a defense of moral realism. For more perspectives on the nature and significance of moral dilemmas, see Gowans (1987). For more on the philosophy of emotions in general, see Calhoun & Solomon (1984).

6. Epistemological Issues in Metaethics

Analytic metaethics also explores questions of how we make moral judgments in the first place, and how (if at all) we are able to know moral truths. The field of moral epistemology can be divided into questions about what moral knowledge is, how moral beliefs can be justified, and where moral knowledge comes from.

a. Thick and Thin Moral Concepts

Moral epistemology explores the contours of moral knowledge itself—not the specific content of individual moral beliefs, but the conceptual characteristics of moral beliefs as a general epistemic category. Here, one of the biggest questions concerns whether moral knowledge involves claims about generic moral values such “goodness” or “wrongness” (so-called “thin” moral concepts) or whether moral knowledge may be obtained at the somewhat more concrete level of concepts such as “courage”, “intemperance”, or “compassion” (which seem to have a “thicker” descriptive content). The general methodology of the thick-thin distinction was popularized by Clifford Geertz (1973) following the introduction of the terminology by Gilbert Ryle (1968). Its specific application to metaethics, however, is due largely to Bernard Williams’ (1985) famous argument that genuine (that is, action-guiding) moral knowledge can only exist at the thicker level of concrete moral concepts. This represents what Williams called the “limits of philosophy,” since philosophical theorizing aims instead at more abstract, thin moral principles. Furthermore, according to Williams, this epistemological point about the thickness of moral knowledge has important implications for the ontology of moral values; namely, Williams defends a kind metaethical relativism on the grounds that, even if thin moral concepts such as “goodness” are universal across different societies, the more specific thick concepts that he thinks really matter to us morally are specified in often divergent ways, for example, two societies that both praise “goodness” may nonetheless have quite different understandings of what counts as “bravery”.

Emphasis on thick moral concepts has been prevalent in virtue ethics in general. For example, Alasdair MacIntyre (1984) has famously defended the neo-Aristotelian view that ethics must be grounded in a “tradition” that is coherent and stable enough to thickly specify virtues and virtuous role-models. Indeed, part of the challenge that MacIntyre sees facing contemporary societies is that increased cross-cultural interconnectedness has fomented a fragmentation of traditional virtue frameworks, engendering a moral cacophony that threatens to undermine moral motivation, knowledge, and even our confidence in what counts as “rational” (MacIntyre 1988). More recently, David B. Wong (2000) has offered a contemporary Confucian response to MacIntyre-style worries about moral fragmentation in democratic societies, arguing that pluralistic societies may still retain a coherent tradition in the form of civic “rituals” such as voting.

A related metaethical issue concerns the scope of moral judgments and the extent to which such judgments may ever legitimately be made universally or whether they ought instead to be indexed to particular situations or contexts; this view is commonly known as moral particularism (compare, Hooker and Little 2000; Dancy 2006).

b. Moral Justification and Explanation

Metaethical positions may also be divided according to how they envision the requirements of justifying moral beliefs. Traditional philosophical accounts of epistemological justification are requisitioned and modified specifically to accommodate moral knowledge. A popular version of a theory of moral-epistemic justification may be called metaethical foundationalism—the view that moral beliefs are epistemically justified by appeal to other moral beliefs, until this justificatory process terminates at some bedrock beliefs whose own justifications are “self-evident.” By contrast, metaethical coherentism requires for the epistemic justification of a moral belief only that it be part of a network of other beliefs, all of which are jointly consistent (compare, Sayre-McCord 1985; Brink 1989). Mark Timmons (1996) also defends a form of metaethical contextualism, according to which justification is determined either by reference to some relevant set of epistemic practices and norms (a view Timmons calls “normative contextualism” and which also bears strong similarity with the movement known as virtue epistemology), or else by reference to some more basic beliefs (a view Timmons calls “structural contextualism” and which seems very similar to foundationalism). Kai Nielsen (1997) has offered another account of contextualist ethical justification with reference to internal systems of religious belief and explanation (see Religious Epistemology).

Early 21st century work in metaethics has gone into exploring precisely what is involved in the “self-evidence” envisioned by foundationalist accounts of moral justification. Roger Crisp (2002) notes that most historical deployments of “self-evidence” in moral epistemology tended to associate it with obviousness or certainty. For instance, the ethical intuitionism of much of the early part of the 20th century (particularly following Moore’s Open Question Argument, as discussed above) tended to adopt this stance toward moral truths (compare, Stratton-Lake 2002). It was this understanding of metaethical foundationalism which led J.L. Mackie (1977) to object to what he saw as the “epistemological queerness” of realist or objectivist ontology. In later years, though, more sophisticated versions of metaethical foundationalism have sought interpretations of the “self-evidence” of basic, justifying moral beliefs in a way that need not involve dogmatic or naive assumptions of obviousness; but might instead require only that such basic moral beliefs are epistemically justified non-inferentially (Audi 1999; Shafer-Landau 2003). One candidate for what it might mean for a moral belief to be epistemically justified non-inferentially has involved an appeal to the model of perceptual beliefs (Blum 1991; DeLapp 2007). Non-moral perceptual beliefs are typically viewed as decisive vis-à-vis justification, provided the perceiver is in appropriate, reliable perceptual conditions. In other words, according to this view, the belief “There is a coffee mug in front of me” is epistemically justified just in case one takes oneself to be perceiving a coffee mug and provided that one is not suffering from hallucinations, merely using one’s peripheral vision, or in a dark room. (See also epistemology of perception.)

Although not addressing this issue of moral perception, Russ Shafer-Landau (2003) has argued on a related note that, ultimately, the difference between metaethical naturalism versus non-naturalism (as described in section 4a) might not be so much ontological or metaphysical, as it is epistemological. Specifically, according to Shafer-Landau, metaethical naturalists are those who require that the epistemic justification of moral beliefs be inferred on the basis of other non-moral beliefs about the natural world; whereas metaethical non-naturalists allow for the epistemic justification of moral beliefs to be terminated with some brute moral beliefs that are themselves sui generis.

Aside from the questions of the scope, source, and justification of moral beliefs, another epistemological facet of metaethics concerns the explanatory role that putative moral properties play with respect to moral beliefs. A useful way to frame this issue is by reference to Roderick Chisholm’s (1981) influential point about direct attribution. Chisholm noted that we refer to external things by attributing properties to them directly. Using this language, we may frame the metaethical question as whether or not our attribution of moral properties to actions, characters, and so forth, is “direct” (that is, external). Gilbert Harman (1977) has famously argued that our attribution of moral properties is not direct in this way. According to Harman, objective moral properties, if they existed, would be explanatorily impotent, in the sense that our specific, first-order moral beliefs can already be sufficiently accounted for by appealing to naturalistic, psychological, or perceptual factors. For example, if we were to witness people gleefully torturing a defenseless animal, we would likely form the belief that their action is morally wrong; but, according to Harman, we could adequately explain this moral evaluation solely by citing various sociological, emotional, behavioral, and perceptual causal factors, without needing to posit any mysterious additional properties that our evaluation is also channeling. This explanatory impotence, Harman believes, constitutes a serious disanalogy between, on the one hand, the role that abstract metaethical properties play in actual (first-order) moral judgments and, on the other hand, the role that theoretical scientific entities play in actual (first-order) perceptual judgments. For example, imagine that we were witnessing the screen-representation of a particle accelerator, instead of people torturing an animal. Although we do not literally see a subatomic particle on the screen (rather, we see a bunch of pixels which we interpret as referring to a subatomic particle) any more than we literally see “wrongness” floating around the animal-torturers, the essential difference between the two cases is that the additional abstract belief that there really are subatomic particles is necessary to explain why we infer them on the basis of screen-pixels; whereas, according to Harman, the alleged property of objective “wrongness” is unnecessary to explain why we disapprove of torture. Nicholas Sturgeon (1988), however, has argued contrary to Harman that second-order metaethical properties do play legitimate explanatory roles, for the simple reason that they are cited in people’s justification of why they find the torturing of animals morally wrong. Thus, for Sturgeon, what will count as the “best explanation” of a phenomenon—namely, the phenomenon of morally condemning the torturing of an animal—must be understood in the broader context of our overall explanatory goals, one of which will be to make sense of why we think that torturing animals is objectively wrong in the first place.

7. Anthropological Considerations

Although much of analytic metaethics concerns rarified debates that can often be highly abstracted from actual, applied moral concerns, several metaethical positions have also drawn heavily on cultural anthropological considerations to motivate or flesh-out their views. After all, as discussed above in section one, it has often been actual, historical moments of cultural instability or diversity that have stimulated metaethical reflection on the nature and status of moral values.

a. Cross-Cultural Differences

One of the most influential anthropological aspects of metaethics concerns the apparent challenge that pervasive and persistent cross-cultural moral disagreement would seem to present for moral realists or objectivists. If, as the realist envisions, moral values were truly universal and objective, then why is it the case that so many different people seem to have such drastically different convictions about what is right and wrong? The more plausible explanation of the fact that people persistently disagree about moral matters, so the argument goes, is simply that there are no objective moral truths capable of settling their dispute. As opposed to the apparent convergence in other, non-moral realms of dispute (for example, scientific, perceptual, and so forth), moral disagreement seems both ubiquitous and largely resistant to rational adjudication. J.L. Mackie (1977) leverages these features of moral disagreement to motivate what he calls The Argument from Relativity. This argument begins with the descriptive, anthropological observation that different cultures endorse different moral values and practices, and then argues as an inference to the most likely explanation of this fact that metaethical relativism best accounts for such cross-cultural discrepancies.

Mackie refers to such cross-cultural moral differences as “well-known” and, indeed, it seems prima facie obvious that different cultures have different practices. Mackie’s argument, however, seeks a diversity of practices that is not merely descriptively different on the surface, but that is deeply morally different, if not ultimately incommensurable. James Rachels (1986) describes the difference between surface, descriptive difference versus deep, moral difference by reference to the well-worn example of the traditional Inuit practice of leaving elders to die from exposure. Although at the surface level of description, this practice seems radically different from contemporary Western attitudes toward the ethical treatment of the elderly (pervasive elder-abuse notwithstanding), the underlying moral justification for the practice—namely, that material resources are limited, the elders themselves choose this fate, the practice is a way for elders to die with dignity, and so forth—sounds remarkably similar in spirit to the familiar sorts of moral values contemporary Westerners invoke.

Cultural anthropology itself has generated controversy regarding the extent as well as the metaethical significance of moral differences at the deep level of fundamental justifications and values. Responding to both the assumption of cultural superiority as well as the Romantic attraction to viewing exotic cultures as Noble Savages, early twentieth-century anthropologists frequently adopted a methodology of relativism, on the grounds that accurate empirical information would be ignored if a cultural difference was examined with any a priori moral bias. An early exponent of this anthropological relativism was William Graham Sumner (1906) who, reflecting on what he referred to as different cultural folkways (that is, traditions or practices), claimed provocatively that, “the folkways are their own warrant.” Numerous anthropologists who were influenced by Franz Boas (1911) adopted a similar refusal to morally evaluate cross-cultural differences, culminating in an explicit embrace of metaethical relativism by anthropologists such as Ruth Benedict (1934) and Melville Herskovits (1952).

Several notable philosophers in the Continental tradition have also affirmed the sociological and anthropological relativism mentioned above. Specifically, the deconstructivism of Jacques Derrida, with its suspicion regarding “logocentric” biases, might be understood as a warning against metaethical objectivism. Instead, a deconstructivist might argue that ethical meaning (like all meaning) is characterized by what Derrida called différance, that is, an intractable un-decidability. (See Derrida (1996), however, for the possibility of a less relativistic deconstructivist ethics.) Other contemporary Continental approaches have similarly eschewed realism. For example, Mary Daly (1978) has defended a radical feminist critique of the sexual biases inherent in how we talk about values. For other perspectives on the possible tensions between feminism and the metaethics of cultural diversity, see Okin (1999) and Nussbaum (1999: 29-54). Michel Foucault (1984) is also well-known for his general criticism of the uses and abuses of power in the construction and expression of moral valuations pertaining to mental health, sexuality, and criminality. Similar critiques concerning the transplantation of a particular set of cultural values to other cultural contexts have been expressed by a number of post-colonialists and literary theorists, who have theorized about the imperialism, silencing (Spivak 1988), Orientalism (Said 1978), and cultural hybridity (Bhabha 1994) such moral universalism may involve.

b. Cross-Cultural Similarities

For all the apparent cross-cultural moral diversity, however, there have also been several suggestions against extending anthropological relativism to the metaethical level. First, a variety of empirical studies seem to suggest that the degree of moral similarity at the deep level of fundamental justifications and values may be greater than Boas and his students anticipated. Thus, for example, Jonathan Haidt (2004) has argued that cross-cultural differences show strong evidence of resolving around a finite number of basic moral values (what Haidt calls “modules”). From a somewhat more abstract perspective, Thomas Kasulis (2002) has also defended the view that cross-cultural differences can be sorted into two fundamental “orientations.” However, the congealing of cross-cultural differences around a small, finite number of basic values need not prove moral realism—for, those basic values may themselves still be ultimately relative to human needs and perspectives (compare, Wong 2006).

There are also several theoretical challenges to inferring metaethical relativism from anthropological differences. For one thing, as Michele Moody-Adams (1997) has argued, metaethical assessments about the degree or depth of moral differences are “empirically underdetermined” by the anthropological description of the practices themselves. For example, anthropological data about the moral content of a culturally different practice may be biased on behalf of the cultural informant who supplies the data or characterization. Similar critiques of cross-cultural moral relativism have leveraged what is known as The Principle of Charity—the hermeneutic insight that differences must at least be commensurable enough to even be framed as “different” from one another in the first place. Thus, goes the argument, if cross-cultural moral differences were so radically different as to be incomparable to one another, we could never truly morally disagree at all; we would instead be simply “talking past” one another (compare Davidson 2001). Much of our ability to translate between the moral practices of one culture and another—an ability central to the very enterprise of comparative philosophy—presupposes that even moral differences are still recognizably moral differences at root.

8. Political Implications of Metaethics

In addition to accommodating or accounting for the existence of moral disagreements, metaethics has also been thought to provide some insight concerning how we should respond to such differences at the normative or political level. Most often, debates concerning the morally appropriate response to moral differences have been framed against analyses concerning the relationship between metaethics and toleration. On the one hand, tolerating practices and values with which one might disagree has been a hallmark of liberal democratic societies. Should this permissive attitude, however, be extended indiscriminately to all values and practices with which one disagrees? Are some moral differences simply intolerable, such that it would undermine one’s own moral convictions to even attempt to tolerate them? More vexingly, is it conceptually possible or desirable to tolerate the intolerance of others (a paradox sometimes referred to as the Liberal’s Dilemma)? Karl Popper (1945) famously argued against the toleration of intolerance, which he saw as an overly-indulgent extension of the concept and one which would undermine the “open society” he believed to be a prerequisite for toleration in the first place. By contrast, John Rawls (1971) has argued that toleration—even of intolerance—is a constitutive part of justice (derivable from what Rawls calls the “liberty principle” of justice), such that failure to be tolerant would entail failure to satisfy one of the requirements of justice. Rawls emphasizes, however, that genuine toleration need not lead to utopia or agreement, and that it is substantially different from a mere modus vivendi, that is, simply putting up with one another because we are powerless to do otherwise. According to Rawls, true toleration requires that we seek to bring our differences into an “overlapping consensus,” which he claims will be possible due to an inherent incompleteness and “looseness in our comprehensive views” (2001: 193).

The value of toleration is often claimed as an exclusive asset of individual metaethical theories. For example, metaethical relativists frequently argue that only by acknowledging the ultimately subjective and conventional nature of morality can we make sense of why we should not morally judge others’ values or practices—after all, according to relativism, there would be no culture-transcendent standard against which to make such judgments. For this reason, Neil Levy claims that, “The perception that relativism promotes, or is the expression of, tolerance of difference is almost certainly the single most important factor in explaining its attraction” (2002: 56). Indeed, even metaethical realists (Shafer-Landau 2004: 30-31) often observe that undergraduate endorsements of relativism seem to be motivated by an anxiety about condemning foreign practices. Despite the apparent leeway with respect to moral differences that metaethical relativism would appear to allow, several realists have argued, by contrast, that relativism could equally be as compatible with intolerance. After all, goes the argument, if nothing is objectively or universally morally wrong, then a fortiori intolerant practices cannot be said to be universally or objectively wrong either. People or cultures who do not approve of an intolerant practice would only be reflecting their own culture’s commitment to toleration (compare Graham 1996). For this reason, several metaethicists have argued that realism alone can support the commitment to toleration as a universal value—such that intolerance can be morally condemned—because only realism allows for the existence of universal, objective moral values (compare, Shafer-Landau 2004: 30-33). Nicholas Rescher (1993) expresses a related worry about what he calls “indifferentism”—a nihilistic nonchalance regarding specific ethical commitments that might be occasioned by an embrace of metaethical relativism. Rescher’s own solution to the potential problem of indifferentism (he calls his view “contextualism” or “perspectival rationalism”) involves the recognition of the reasons-giving nature of circumstances, such that different situations may supply their own “local” justifications for particular political or moral commitments.

The question of which metaethical theory—realism or relativism—can lay better claim to toleration, however, has been complicated by reflection on what “toleration” truly involves and whether it is always, in fact, a moral value. Andrew Cohen (2004), for instance, has argued that “toleration” by definition must involve some negative evaluation of the practice or value that is tolerated. Thus, on this analysis, it would seem that one may only tolerate that which one finds intolerable. This has led philosophers such as Bernard Williams (1996) to question whether toleration—understood as requiring moral disapproval—is even possible, let alone whether it is truly a moral value itself. (For more discussion on toleration, see Heyd 1996.) In a related vein, Richard Rorty (1989) has argued that what a society finds intolerant is itself morally constitutive of that society’s identity, and that recognition of the metaethical contingency of one’s particular social tolerance might itself provide an important sense of political “solidarity.” For these reasons, other philosophers have considered alternative understandings of toleration that might be more amenable to particular metaethical theories. David B. Wong (2006: 228-272), for example, has developed an account of what he calls accommodation, according to which even relativists may still share a higher-order commitment to the need for different practices and values to be arranged in such a way as to minimize social and political friction.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Textual Citations

  • Adams, Robert. (1987). The Virtue of Faith and Other Essays in Philosophical Theology. Oxford University Press.
  • Altham, J.E.J. (1986) “The Legacy of Emotivism,” in Macdonald & Wright, eds. Fact, Science, and Morality. Oxford University Press, 1986.
  • Appiah, Kwame Anthony. (2008). Experiments in Ethics. Harvard University Press.
  • Audi, Robert. (1999). “Moral Knowledge and Ethical Pluralism,” in Greco and Sosa, eds. Blackwell Guide to Epistemology, 1999, ch. 6.
  • Ayer, A.J. (1936). Language, Truth and Logic. Gollancz Press.
  • Benedict, Ruth. (1934). “Anthropology and the Abnormal,” Journal of General Psychology 10: 59-79.
  • Beyleveld, Deryck. (1992). The Dialectical Necessity of Morality. University of Chicago Press.
  • Bhabha, Homi. (1994). The Location of Culture. Routledge Press.
  • Blackburn, Simon. (1984). Spreading the Word. Oxford University Press.
  • Blackburn, Simon. (1993). Essays in Quasi-Realism. Oxford University Press.
  • Blair, Richard. (1995). “A Cognitive Developmental Approach to Morality: Investigating the Psychopath,” Cognition 57: 1-29.
  • Bloomfield, Paul. (2001). Moral Reality. Oxford University Press.
  • Blum, Lawrence. (1991). “Moral Perception and Particularity,” Ethics 101 (4): 701-725.
  • Boas, Franz. (1911). The Mind of Primitive Man. Free Press.
  • Boisvert, Daniel. (2008). “Expressive-Assertivism,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 89 (2): 169-203.
  • Boyd, Richard. (1988). “How to be a Moral Realist,” in Essays on Moral Realism, ed. Geoffrey      Sayre-McCord. Cornell University Press 1988, ch. 9.
  • Boylan, Michael. (2004). A Just Society. Rowman & Littlefield Publishers.
  • Boylan, Michael, ed. (1999). Gewirth: Critical Essays on Action, Rationality, and Community. Rowman & Littlefield Publishers.
  • Brink, David. (1989). Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics. Cambridge University Press.
  • Calhoun, Cheshire and Solomon, Robert, eds. What Is An Emotion? Oxford University Press.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. (1981). The First Person: An Essay on Reference and Intentionality. University of Minnesota Press.
  • Cohen, Andrew. (2004). “What Toleration Is,” Ethics 115: 68-95.
  • Copp, David. (2007). Morality in a Natural World. Cambridge University Press.
  • Daly, Mary. (1978). Gyn/Ecology: The Metaethics of Radical Feminism. Beacon Press.
  • Dancy, Jonathan. (2006). Ethics without Principles. Oxford University Press.
  • Dancy, Jonathan. (2000). Practical Reality. Oxford University Press.
  • Darwall, Stephen. (2006). “How Should Ethics Relate to Philosophy?” in Metaethics after Moore, eds. Terry Horgan & Mark Timmons. Oxford University Press 2006, ch.1.
  • Darwall, Stephen. (1995). The British Moralists and the Internal ‘Ought’. Cambridge University Press.
  • Davidson, Donald. (2001). Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation. Clarendon Press.
  • DeLapp, Kevin. (2009). “Les Mains Sales Versus Le Sale Monde: A Metaethical Look at Dirty Hands,” Essays in Philosophy 10 (1).
  • DeLapp, Kevin. (2009). “The Merits of Dispositional Moral Realism,” Journal of Value Inquiry 43 (1):        1-18.
  • DeLapp, Kevin. (2007). “Moral Perception and Moral Realism: An ‘Intuitive’ Account of Epistemic Justification,” Review Journal of Political Philosophy 5: 43-64.
  • Derrida, Jacques. (1996). The Gift of Death. University of Chicago Press.
  • Divers, John and Miller, Alexander. (1994). “Why Expressivists about Value Should Not Love Minimalism about Truth,” Analysis 54 (1): 12-19.
  • Dreier, James. (2004). “Meta-ethics and the Problem of Creeping Minimalism,” Philosophical Perspectives 18: 23-44.
  • Doris, John. (2002). Lack of Character. Cambridge University Press.
  • Dworkin, Ronald. (1996). “Objectivity and Truth: You’d Better Believe It,” Philosophy and Public Affairs 25 (2): 87-139.
  • Firth, Roderick. (1952). “Ethical Absolutism and the Ideal Observer Theory,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 12: 317-345.
  • Flanagan, Owen. (1991). Varieties of Moral Personality. Harvard University Press.
  • Foot, Philippa. (2001). Natural Goodness. Clarendon Press.
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Author Information

Kevin M. DeLapp
Converse College
U. S. A.

Theory of Mind

Theory of Mind is the branch of cognitive science that investigates how we ascribe mental states to other persons and how we use the states to explain and predict the actions of those other persons. More accurately, it is the branch that investigates mindreading or mentalizing or mentalistic abilities. These skills are shared by almost all human beings beyond early childhood. They are used to treat other agents as the bearers of unobservable psychological states and processes, and to anticipate and explain the agents’ behavior in terms of such states and processes. These mentalistic abilities are also called “folk psychology” by philosophers, and “naïve  psychology” and “intuitive psychology” by cognitive scientists.

It is important to note that Theory of Mind is not an appropriate term to characterize this research area (and neither to denote our mentalistic abilities) since it seems to assume right from the start the validity of a specific account of the nature and development of mindreading, that is, the view that it depends on the deployment of a theory of the mental realm, analogous to the theories of the physical world (“naïve physics”). But this view—known as theory-theory—is only one of the accounts offered to explain our mentalistic abilities. In contrast, theorists of mental simulation have suggested that what lies at the root of mindreading is not any sort of folk-psychological conceptual scheme, but rather a kind of mental modeling in which the simulator uses her own mind as an analog model of the mind of the simulated agent.

Both theory-theory and simulation-theory are actually families of theories. Some theory-theorists maintain that our naïve theory of mind is the product of the scientific-like exercise of a domain-general theorizing capacity. Other theory-theorists defend a quite different hypothesis, according to which mindreading rests on the maturation of a mental organ dedicated to the domain of psychology. Simulation-theory also shows different facets. According to the “moderate” version of simulationism, mental concepts are not completely excluded from simulation. Simulation can be seen as a process through which we first generate and self-attribute pretend mental states that are intended to correspond to those of the simulated agent, and then project them onto the target. By contrast, the “radical” version of simulationism rejects the primacy of first-person mindreading and contends that we imaginatively transform ourselves into the simulated agent, interpreting the target’s behavior without using any kind of mental concept, not even ones referring to ourselves.

Finally, the claim─common to both theorists of theory and theorists of simulation─that mindreading plays a primary role in human social understanding was challenged in the early 21st century, mainly by phenomenology-oriented philosophers and cognitive scientists.

Table of Contents

  1. Theory-Theory
    1. The Child-Scientist Theory
    2. The Modularist Theory-Theory
    3. First-Person Mindreading and Theory-Theory
  2. Simulation-Theory
    1. Simulation with and without Introspection
    2. Simulation in Low-Level Mindreading
  3. Social Cognition without Mindreading
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Suggested Further Reading
    2. References

1. Theory-Theory

Social psychologists have investigated mindreading since at least the 1940s. In Heider and Simmel’s (1944) classic studies, participants were presented with animated events involving interacting geometric shapes. When asked to report what they saw, the participants almost invariably treated these shapes as intentional agents with motives and purposes, suggesting the existence of an automatic capacity for mentalistic attribution. Pursuing this line of research would lead to Heider’s The Psychology of Interpersonal Relations (1958), a seminal book which is one of the main historical referents of the scientific inquiry into our mentalistic practice. In this book Heider characterizes “commonsense psychology” as a sophisticated conceptual scheme that has an influence on human perception and action in the social world comparable to that which Kant’s categorical framework has on human perception and action in the physical world (see Malle & Ickes 2000: 201).

Heider’s visionary work played a central role in the origination and definition of attribution theory, that is, the field of social psychology that investigates the mechanisms underlying ordinary explanations of our own and other people’s behavior. However, attribution theory is a quite different way of approaching our mentalistic practice. Heider took commonsense psychology in its real value of knowledge, arguing that scientific psychology has a good deal to learn from it. In contrast, most research on causal attribution has been faithful to behaviorism’s methodological lesson and focused on the epistemic inaccuracy of commonsense psychology.

Two years before Heider’s book, Wilfred Sellars’ (1956) Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind had suggested that our grasp of mental phenomena does not originate from direct access to our inner life, but is the result of a “folk” theory of mind, which we acquire through some form or other of enculturation. Sellars’ speculation turned out to be very philosophically productive and in agreement with social-psychology research on self-attribution, coming to be known as “Theory-Theory” (a term coined by Morton 1980—henceforth “TT”).

During the 1970s one or other form of TT was seen as a very effective antidote to Cartesianism and philosophical behaviorism. In particular, TT was coupled with Nagel’s (1961) classic account of intertheoretic reduction as deduction of the reduced from the reducing theory via bridge principles in order to turn the ontological problem of the relationship between the mental and the physical into a more tractable epistemological problem concerning the relations between theories. Thus it became possible to take a notion—intertheoretic reduction—rigorously studied by philosophers of science; to examine the relations between folk psychology as a theory including the commonsense mentalistic ontology and its scientific successors (scientific psychology, neuroscience, or some other form of science of the mental); and to let ontological/metaphysical questions be answered by (i) focusing on questions about explanation and theory reduction first and foremost, and then (ii) depending on how those first questions were answered, drawing the appropriate ontological/metaphysical conclusions based on a comparison with how similar questions about explanation and reduction got answered in other scientific episodes and the ontological conclusions philosophers and scientists drew in those cases (this strategy is labelled “the intertheoretic-reduction reformulation of the mind-body problem” in Bickle 2003).

In this context, TT was taken as the major premise in the standard argument for eliminative materialism (see Ramsey 2011: §2.1). In its strongest form, eliminativism predicts that part or all of our folk-psychological theory will vanish into thin air, just as it happened in the past when scientific progress led to the abandonment of the folk theory of witchcraft or the protoscientific theories of phlogiston and caloric fluid. This prediction rests on an argument which moves from considering folk psychology as a massively defective theory to the conclusion that—just as with witches, phlogiston, and caloric fluid—folk-psychological entities do not exist. Thus philosophy of mind joined attribution theory in adopting a critical attitude toward the explanatory adequacy of folk psychology (see, for example, Stich’s 1983 eliminativistic doubts about the folk concept of belief, motivated inter alia by the experimental social psychology literature on dissonance and self-attribution).

Notice, however, that TT can be differently construed depending on whether we adopt a personal or subpersonal perspective (see Stich & Ravenscroft 1994: §4). The debate between intentional realists and eliminativists favored David Lewis’ personal-level formulation of TT. According to Lewis, the folk theory of mind is implicit in our everyday talk about mental states. We entertain “platitudes” regarding the causal relations of mental states, sensory stimuli, and motor responses that can be systematized (or “Ramsified”). The result is a functionalist theory that gives the terms of mentalistic vocabulary their meaning in the same way as scientific theories define their theoretical terms, namely “as the occupants of the causal roles specified by the theory…; as the entities, whatever those may be, that bear certain causal relations to one another and to the referents of the O[bservational]-terms” (Lewis 1972: 211). In this perspective, mindreading can be described as an exercise in reflective reasoning, which involves the application of general reasoning abilities to premises including ceteris paribus folk-psychological generalizations. A good example of this conception of mindreading is Grice’s schema for the derivation of conversational implicatures:

He said that P; he could not have done this unless he thought that Q; he knows (and knows that I know that he knows) that I will realize that it is necessary to suppose that Q; he has done nothing to stop me thinking that Q; so he intends me to think, or is at least willing for me to think, that Q(Grice 1989: 30-1; cit. in Wilson 2005: 1133).

Since the end of the 1970s, however, primatology, developmental psychology, cognitive neuropsychiatry and empirically-informed philosophy have been contributing to a collaborative inquiry into TT. In the context of this literature the term “theory” refers to a “tacit” or “sub-doxastic” structure of knowledge, a corpus of internally represented information that guides the execution of mentalistic capacities. But then the functionalist theory that fixes the meaning of mentalistic terms is not the theory implicit in our everyday, mentalistic talk, but the tacit theory (in Chomsky’s sense) subserving our thought and talk about the mental realm (see Stich & Nichols 2003: 241). On this perspective, the inferential processes that depend on the theory have an automatic and unconscious character that distinguishes them from reflective reasoning processes.

In developmental psychology part of the basis for the study of mindreading skills in children was already in Jean Piaget’s seminal work on egocentrism in the 1930s to 50s, and the work on metacognition (especially metamemory) in the 1970s. But the developmental research on mindreading took off only under the thrust of three discoveries in the 1980s (see Leslie 1998). First, normally developing 2-year-olds are able to engage in pretend play. Second, normally developing children undergo a deep change in their understanding of the psychological states of other people somewhere between the ages of 3 and 4, as indicated especially by the appearance of their ability to solve a variety of “false-belief” problems (see immediately below). Lastly, children diagnosed with autism spectrum disorders are especially impaired in attributing mental states to other people.

In particular, Wimmer & Perner (1983) provided the theory-of-mind research with a seminal experimental paradigm: the “false-belief task.” In the most well-known version of this task, a child watches two puppets interacting in a room. One puppet (“Sally”) puts a toy in location A and then leaves the room. While Sally is out of the room, the other puppet (“Anne”) moves the toy from location A to location B. Sally returns to the room, and the child onlooker is asked where she will look for her toy, in location A or in location B. Now, 4- and 5-year-olds have little difficulty passing this test, judging that Sally will look for her toy in location A although it really is in location B. These correct answers provide evidence that the child realizes that Sally does not know that the toy has been moved, and so will act upon a false belief. Many younger children, typically 3-year-olds, fail such a task, often asserting that Sally will look for the toy in the place where it was moved. Dozens of versions of this task have now been used, and while the precise age of success varies between children and between task versions, in general we can confidently say that children begin to successfully perform the (“verbal”) false-belief tasks at around 4 years (see the meta-analysis in Wellman et al. 2001; see also below, the reference to “non-verbal” false-belief tasks).

Wimmer and Perner’s false-belief task set off a flood of experiments concerning the infant understanding of the mind. In this context, the first hypotheses about the process of acquisition of the naïve theory of mind were suggested. The finding that mentalistic skills emerge very early, in the first 3-4 years, and in a way relatively independent from the development of other cognitive abilities, led some scholars (for example, Simon Baron-Cohen, Jerry Fodor, Alan Leslie) to conceive them as the end-state of the endogenous maturation of an innate theory-of-mind module (or system of modules). This contrasted with the view of other researchers (for example, Alison Gopnik, Josef Perner, Henry Wellman), who maintained that the intuitive theory of mind develops in childhood in a manner comparable to the development of scientific theories.

a. The Child-Scientist Theory

According to a first version of TT, “the child (as little) scientist theory,” the body of internally-represented knowledge that drives the exercise of mentalistic abilities has much the same structure as a scientific theory, and it is acquired, stored, and used in much the same way that scientific theories are: by formulating explanations, making predictions, and then revising the theory or modifying auxiliary hypotheses when the predictions fail.  Gopnik & Meltzoff (1997) put forward this idea in its more radical form. They argue that the body of knowledge underlying mindreading has all the structural, functional and dynamic features that, on their view, characterize most scientific theories. One of the most important features is defeasibility.  As it happens in scientific practice, the child’s naïve theory of mind can also be “annulled,” that is, replaced when an accumulation of counterevidence to it occurs. The child-scientist theory is, therefore, akin to Piaget’s constructivism insofar as it depicts the cognitive development in childhood and early adolescence as a succession of increasingly sophisticated naïve theories. For instance, Wellman (1990) has argued that around age 4 children become able to pass the false-belief tests because they move from an elementary “copy” theory of mind to a fully “representational” theory of mind, which allows them to acknowledge the explanatory role of false beliefs.

The child-scientist theory inherits from Piaget not only the constructivist framework but also the idea that the cognitive development is a process that depends on a domain-general learning mechanism. A domain-general (or general-purpose) psychological structure is one that can be used to do problem solving across many different content domains; it contrasts with a domain-specific psychological structure, which is dedicated to solving a restricted class of problems in a restricted content domain (see Samuels 2000). Now, Piaget’s model of cognitive development posits an innate endowment of reflexes and domain-general learning mechanisms, which enable the child to set up sensorimotor interactions with the environment that unfold a steady improvement in the capacity of problem-solving in any cognitive domain—physical, biological, psychological, and so forth. Analogously, Gopnik & Schulz (2004, 2007) have argued that the learning mechanism that supports all of cognitive development is a domain-general Bayesian mechanism that allows children to extract causal structure from patterns of data.

Another theory-theorist who endorses a domain-general conception of cognitive development is Josef Perner (1991). On his view, it is the appearance of the ability to metarepresent that enables the 4-year-olds to shift from a “situation theory” to a “representation theory,” and thus pass false-belief tests. Children are situation theorists by the age of around 2 years. At 3 they possess a concept, “prelief” (or “betence”), in which the concepts of pretend and belief coexist undifferentiated. The concept of prelief allows the child to understand that a person can “act as if” something was such and such (for example, as if “this banana is a telephone”) when it is not. At 4 children acquire a representational concept of belief which enables them to understand that, like the public representations, inner representations can also misrepresent states of affairs (see Perner, Baker & Hutton 1994). Thus Perner suggests that children first learn to understand the properties of public (pictorial and linguistic) representations; only in a second moment they extend, through a process of analogical reasoning, these characteristics to mental representations. On this perspective, then, the concept of belief is the product of a domain-general metarepresentational capacity that includes but is not limited to metarepresentation of mental states. (But for criticism, see Harris 2000, who argues that pretence and belief are very different and are readily distinguished by context by 3-year olds.)

b. The Modularist Theory-Theory

According to the child-scientist theory, children learn the naïve theory of mind in much the same way that adults learn about scientific theories. By contrast, the modularist version of TT holds that the body of knowledge underlying mindreading lacks the structure of a scientific theory, being stored in one or more innate modules, which gradually become functional (“mature”) during infant development. Inside the module the body of information can be stored as a suite of domain-specific computational mechanisms; or as a system of domain-specific representations; or in both ways (see Simpson et al. 2005: 13).

The notion of modularity as domain-specificity, whose paradigm is Noam Chomsky’s module of language, informs the so-called “core knowledge” hypothesis, according to which human cognition builds on a repertoire of domain-specific systems of knowledge. Studies of children and adults in diverse cultures, human infants, and non-human primates provide evidence for at least four systems of knowledge that serve to represent significant aspects of the environment: inanimate objects and their motions; agents and their goal-directed actions; places and their geometric relations; sets and their approximate numerical relation. These are systems of domain-specific, task-specific representations, which are shared by other animals, persist in adults, and show little variation by culture, language or sex (see Carey & Spelke 1996; Spelke & Kinzler 2007).

And yet a domain-specific body of knowledge is an “inert” psychological structure, which gives rise to behavior only if it is manipulated by some cognitive mechanism. The question arises, then, whether the domain-specific body of information that subserves mentalistic abilities is the database of either a domain-specific or domain-general computational system. In some domains, a domain-specific computational mechanism and a domain-specific body of information can form a single mechanism (for example, a parser is very likely to be a domain-specific computational mechanism that manipulates a domain-specific data structure). But in other domains, as Samuels (1998, 2000) has noticed, domain-specific systems of knowledge might be computed by domain-general rather than domain-specific algorithms (but for criticism, see Carruthers 2006, §4.3).

The existence of a domain-specific algorithm that exploits a body of information specific to the domain of naïve psychology has been proposed by Alan Leslie (1994, 2000). He postulated a specialized component of social intelligence, the “Theory-of-Mind Mechanism” (ToMM), which receives as input information about the past and present behavior of other people and utilizes this information to compute their probable psychological states. The outputs of ToMM are descriptions of psychological states in the form of metarepresentations or M-representations, that is, agent-centered descriptions of behavior, which include a triadic relation that specifies four kinds of information: (i) an agent, (ii) an informational relation that specifies the agent’s attitude (pretending, believing, desiring, and so forth), (iii) an aspect of reality that grounds the agent’s attitude, (iv) the content of the agent’s attitude. Therefore, in order to pretend and understand others’ pretending, the child’s ToMM is supposed to output the M-representation <Mother PRETENDS (of) this banana (that) “it is a telephone”>. Analogously, in order to predict Sally’s behavior in the false-belief test, ToMM is supposed to output the M-representation <Sally BELIEVES (of) her marble (that) “it is in the basket”>. (Note that Leslie coined the term “M-representation” to distinguish his own concept of meta-representation from Perner’s 1991. For Perner uses the term at a personal level to refer to the child’s conscious theory of representation, whereas Leslie utilizes the term at a subpersonal level to designate an unconscious data structure computed by an information-processing mechanism. See Leslie & Thaiss 1992: 231, note 2.)

In the 1980s, Leslie’s ToMM hypothesis was the basis for the development of a neuropsychological perspective on autism. Children suffering from this neurodevelopmental disorder exhibit a triad of impairments: social incompetence, poor verbal and nonverbal communicative skills, and a lack of pretend play. Because social competence, communication, and pretending all rest on mentalistic abilities, Baron-Cohen, Frith & Leslie (1985) speculated that the autistic triad might be the result of an impaired ToMM. This hypothesis was investigated in an experiment in which typically developing 4-year-olds, children with autism (12 years; IQ 82), and children with Down syndrome (10 years; IQ 64) were tested on the Sally and Ann false-belief task. Eighty-five percent of the normally developing children and 86% of the children with Down syndrome passed the test; but only 20% of the autistic children predicted that Sally would look in the basket. This is one of the first examples of psychiatry driven by cognitive neuropsychology (followed by Christopher Frith’s 1992 theory of schizophrenia as late-onset autism).

According to Leslie, the ToMM is the specific innate basis of basic mentalistic abilities, which matures during the infant’s second year. In support of this hypothesis, he cites inter alia his analysis of pretend play that would show that 18-month-old children are able to metarepresent the propositional attitude of pretending. This analysis results, however, in an immediate empirical problem. If the ToMM is fully functional at 18 months, why are children unable to successfully perform false-belief tasks until they are around 4 years old? Leslie’s hypothesis is that although the concept of belief is already in place in children younger than 4, in the false-belief tasks this concept is masked by immaturity in another capacity that is necessary for good performance on the task—namely inhibitory control. Since, by default, the ToMM attributes a belief with content that reflects current reality, to succeed in a false-belief task this default attribution must be inhibited and an alternative nonfactual content for the belief selected instead. This is the task of an executive control mechanism that Leslie calls “Selection Processor” (SP). Thus 3-year-olds fail standard false-belief tasks because they possess the ToMM but not yet the inhibitory SP (see Leslie & Thaiss 1992; Leslie & Polizzi 1998).

The ToMM/SP model seems to find support in a series of experiments that test understanding of false mental and public representations in normal and autistic children. Leslie & Thaiss (1992) have found that normal 3-year-olds fail the standard false-belief tasks, the two non-mental meta-representational tests, the false-map task and Zaitchik’s (1990) outdated-photograph task. In contrast, autistic children are at or near ceiling on the non-mental metarepresentational tests but fail false-belief tasks. Normal 4-year-olds can succeed in all these tasks. According to Leslie and Thaiss, the ToMM/SP model can account for these findings: normal 3-year-olds possess the ToMM but not yet SP; autistic children are impaired in ToMM but not in SP; normal 4-year-olds possess both the ToMM and an adequate SP. By contrast, these results appear to be counterevidence to Perner’s idea that children first understand public representations before then applying that understanding to mental states. If this were right, then autistic children should have difficulty with both kinds of representations. And in fact Perner (1993) suggests that the autistic deficit is due to a genetic impairment of the mechanisms that subserve attention shifting, a damage that interferes with the formation of the database required for the development of a theory of representation in general. But what autistics’ performance in mental and non-mental metarepresentational tasks seems to show is a dissociation between understanding false maps and outdated photographs, on one hand, and understanding false beliefs, on the other. A finding that can be easily explained in the context of Leslie’s domain-specific approach to mindreading, according to which children with autism have a specific deficit in understanding mental representation but not representation in general. In support of this interpretation, fMRI studies showed that activity in the right temporo-parietal junction is high while participants are thinking about false beliefs, but no different from resting levels while participants are thinking about outdated photographs or false maps or signs. This suggests a neural substrate for the behavioral dissociation between pictorial and mental metarepresentational abilities (see Saxe & Kanwisher 2003; for a critical discussion of the domain-specificity interpretation of these behavioral and neuroimaging data, see Gerrans & Stone 2008; Perner & Aichhorn 2008; Perner & Leekam 2008).

Leslie (2005) recruits new data to support his claim that mental metarepresentational abilities emerge from a specialized neurocognitive mechanism that matures during the second year of life. Standard false-belief tasks are “elicited-response” tasks in which children are asked a direct question about an agent’s false belief. But investigations using “spontaneous-response” tasks (Onishi & Baillargeon 2005) seem to suggest that the ability to attribute false beliefs is present much earlier, at the age of 15 months (even at 13 months in Surian, Caldi & Sperber 2007). However, Leslie’s mentalistic interpretation of these data has been challenged by Ruffman & Perner (2005), who have proposed an explanation of Onishi and Baillargeon’s results that assumes that the infants might be employing a non-mentalistic behavior-rule such as, “People look for objects where last seen” (for replies, see Baillargeon et al. 2010).

The ToMM has been considered, contra Fodor, as one of the strongest candidates for central modularity (see, for example, Botterill & Carruthers 1999: 67-8). However, Samuels (2006: 47) has objected that it is difficult to establish whether or not the ToMM’s domain of application is really central cognition. He suggests that the question is still more controversial in light of Leslie’s proposal of modelling ToMM as a relatively low-level mechanism of selective attention, whose functioning depends on SP, which is a non-modular mechanism, penetrable to knowledge and instruction (see Leslie, Friedman & German 2004).

c. First-Person Mindreading and Theory-Theory

During the 1980s and 1990s most of the work in Theory of Mind was concerned with the mechanisms that subserve the attribution of psychological states to others (third-person mindreading). In the last decade, however, an increasing number of psychologists and philosophers have also proposed accounts of the mechanisms underlying the attribution of psychological states to oneself (first-person mindreading).

For most theory-theorists, first-person mindreading is an interpretative activity that depends on mechanisms that capitalize on the same theory of mind used to attribute mental states to other agents. Such mechanisms are triggered by information about mind-external states of affairs, essentially the target’s behavior and/or the situation in which it occurs/occurred. The claim is, then, that there is a functional symmetry between first-person and third-person mentalistic attribution—the “outside access” view of introspection in Robbins (2006: 619); the “symmetrical” or “self/other parity” account of self-knowledge in Schwitzgebel (2010, §2.1).

The first example of a symmetrical account of self-knowledge is Bem’s (1972) “self-perception theory.”  With reference to Skinner’s methodological guidance, but with a position that reveals affinities with symbolic interactionism, Bem holds that one knows one’s own inner states (for example, attitudes and emotions) through a process completely analogous to that occurring when one knows other people’ inner states, that is, by inferring them from the observation/recollection of one’s own behavior and/or the circumstances in which it occurs/occurred. The TT version of the symmetrical account of self-knowledge develops Bem’s approach by claiming that observations and recollections of one’s own behavior and the circumstances in which it occurs/occurred are the input of mechanisms that exploit theories that apply to the same extent to ourselves and to others.

In the well-known social-psychology experiments reviewed by Nisbett & Wilson (1977), the participants’ attitudes and behavior were caused by motivational factors inaccessible to consciousness—such factors as cognitive dissonance, numbers of bystanders in a public crisis, positional and “halo” effects and subliminal cues in problem solving and semantic disambiguation, and so on. However, when explicitly asked about the motivations (causes) of their actions, the subjects did not hesitate to state, sometimes with great eloquence, their very reasonable motives. Nisbett and Wilson explained this pattern of results by arguing that the subjects did not have any direct access to the real causes of their attitudes and behavior; rather, they engaged in an activity of confabulation, that is, they exploited a priori causal theories to develop reasonable but imaginary explanations of the motivational factors of their attitudes and behavior (see also Johansson et al. 2006, where Nisbett and Wilson’s legacy is developed through a new experimental paradigm to study introspection, the “choice blindness” paradigm).

Evidence for the symmetrical account of self-knowledge comes from Nisbett & Bellows’ (1977) utilization of the so-called “actor-observer paradigm.” In one experiment they compared the introspective reports of participants (“actors”) to the reports of a control group of “observers” who were given a general description of the situation and asked to predict how the actors would react. Observers’ predictions were found to be statistically identical to—and as inaccurate as—the reports by the actors. This finding suggests that “both groups produced these reports via the same route, namely by applying or generating similar causal theories” (Nisbett & Wilson 1977: 250-1; see also Schwitzgebel 2010: §§2.1.2 and 4.2.1).

In developmental psychology Alison Gopnik (1993) has defended a symmetrical account of self-knowledge by arguing that there is good developmental evidence of developmental synchronies: children’s understanding of themselves proceeds in lockstep with their understanding of others. For example, since TT assumes that first-person and third-person mentalistic attributions are both subserved by the same theory of mind, it predicts that if the theory is not yet equipped to solve certain third-person false-belief problems, then the child should also be unable to perform the parallel first-person task. A much discussed instance of parallel performance on tasks for self and other is in Gopnik & Astington (1988). In the “Smarties Box” experiment, children were shown with the candy container for the British confection “Smarties” and were asked what they thought was in the container. Naturally they answered “Smarties.” The container was then opened to reveal not Smarties, but a pencil. Children were then asked a series of questions, including “What will [your friend] say is in the box?”, and successively “When you first saw the box, before we opened it, what did you think was inside it?”. It turned out that the children’s ability to answer the question concerning oneself was significantly correlated with their ability to answer the question concerning another. (See also the above-cited Wellman et al. 2001, which offers meta-analytic findings to the effect that performance on false-belief tasks for self and for others is virtually identical at all ages.)

Data from autism have also been used to motivate the claim that first-person and third-person mentalistic attribution has a common basis. An intensely debated piece of evidence comes from a study by Hurlburt, Happé & Frith (1994), in which three people suffering from Asperger syndrome were tested with the descriptive experience sampling method. In this experimental paradigm, subjects are instructed to carry a random beeper, pay attention to the experience that was ongoing at the moment of the beep, and jot down notes about that now-immediately-past experience (see Hurlburt & Schwitzgebel 2007). The study showed marked qualitative differences in introspection in the autistic subjects: unlike normal subjects who report several different phenomenal state types—including inner verbalisation, visual images, unsymbolised thinking, and emotional feelings—the first two autistic subjects reported visual images only; the third subject could report no inner experience at all. According to Frith & Happé (1999: 14), this evidence strengthens the hypothesis that self-awareness, like other-awareness, is dependent on the same theory of mind.

Thus, evidence from social psychology, development psychology and cognitive neuropsychiatry makes a case for a symmetrical account of self-knowledge. As Schwitzgebel (2010: §2.1.3) rightly notes, however, no one advocates a thoroughly symmetrical conception because some margin is always left for some sort of direct self-knowledge. Nisbett & Wilson (1977: 255), for example, draw a sharp distinction between “cognitive processes” (the causal processes underlying judgments, decisions, emotions, sensations) and mental “content” (those judgments, decisions, emotions, sensations themselves). Subjects have “direct access” to this mental content, and this allows them to know it “with near certainty.” In contrast, they have no access to the processes that cause behavior. However, insofar as Nisbett and Wilson do not propose any hypothesis about this alleged direct self-knowledge, their theory is incomplete.

In order to offer an account of this supposedly direct self-knowledge, some philosophers made a more or less radical return to various forms of Cartesianism, construing first-person mindreading as a process that permits the access to at least some mental phenomena in a relatively direct and non-interpretative way. On this perspective, introspective access does not appeal to theories that serve to interpret “external” information, but rather exploits mechanisms that can receive information about inner life through a relatively direct channel— the “inside access” view of introspection in Robbins (2006: 618); the “self-detection” account of self-knowledge in Schwitzgebel (2010: §2.2).

The inside access view comes in various forms. Mentalistic self-attribution may be realized by a mechanism that processes information about the functional profile of mental states, or their representational content, or both kinds of information (see Robbins 2006: 618; for a “neural” version of the inside access view, see below, §2a). A representationalist-functionalist version of the inside access view is Nichols & Stich’s (2003) account of first-person mindreading in terms of “monitoring mechanisms.” The authors begin by drawing a distinction between detection and inference. It is one thing to detect mental states, it is another to reason about mental states, that is, using information about mental states to predict and explain one’s own or other people’s mental states and behavior. Moreover, both the attribution of a mental state and the inferences that one can make about it can be referred to oneself or other people. Thus, we get four possible operations: first- and third-person detection, first- and third-person reasoning. Now, Nichols and Stich’s hypothesis is that whereas third-person detecting and first- and third-person reasoning are all subserved by the same theory of mind, the mechanism for detecting one’s own mental states is quite independent of the mechanism that deals with the mental states of other people. More precisely, the Monitoring Mechanism (MM) theory assumes the existence of a suite of distinct self-monitoring computational mechanisms, including one for monitoring and providing self-knowledge of one’s own experiential states, and one for monitoring and providing self-knowledge of one’s own propositional attitudes. Thus, for example, if X believes that p, and the proper MM is activated, it copies the representation p in X’s “Belief Box”, embeds the copy in a representation schema of the form “I believe that___”, and then places this second-order representation back in X’s Belief Box.

Since the MM theory assumes that first-person mindreading does not involve mechanisms of the sort that figure in third-person mindreading, it implies that the first capacity should be dissociable, both diachronically and synchronically, from the second. In support of this prediction Nichols & Stich (2003) cite developmental data to the effect that, on a wide range of tasks, instead of the parallel performance predicted by TT, children exhibit developmental asynchronies. For example, children are capable of attributing knowledge and ignorance to themselves before they are capable of attributing those states to others (Wimmer et al. 1988). Moreover, they suggest—on the basis, inter alia, of a reinterpretation of the aforementioned Hurlburt, Happé & Frith’s (1994) data—that there is some evidence of a double dissociation between schizophrenic and autistic subjects: the MMs might be intact in autistics despite their impairment in third-person mindreading; in schizophrenics the pattern might be reversed.

The MM theory provides a neo-Cartesian reply to TT—and especially to its eliminativist implications inasmuch as the mentalistic self-attributions based on MMs are immune to the potentially distorting influence of our intuitive theory of psychology. However, the MM theory faces at least two difficulties. To start with, the theory must tell us how MM establishes which attitude type (or percept type) a given mental state belongs to (Goldman 2006: 238-9). A possibility is that there is a separate MM for each propositional attitude type and for each perceptual modality. But then, as Engelbert and Carruthers (2010: 246) remark, since any MM can be selectively impaired, the MM theory predicts a multitude of dissociations—for example, subjects who can self-attribute beliefs but not desires, or visual experiences but not auditory ones, and so on. However, the hypothesis of such a massive dissociability has little empirical plausibility.

Moreover, Carruthers (2011) has offered a book-length argument against the idea of a direct access to propositional attitudes. His neurocognitive framework is Bernard Baars’ Global Workspace Theory model of consciousness (see Gennaro 2005: §4c), in which a range of perceptual systems “broadcast” their outputs (for example, sensory data from the environment, imagery, somatosensory and proprioceptive data) to a complex of conceptual systems (judgment-forming, memory-forming, desire-forming, decision-making systems, and so forth). Among the conceptual systems there is also a multi-componential “mindreading system,” which generates higher-order judgments about the mental states of others and of oneself. By virtue of receiving globally broadcast perceptual states as input, the mindreading system can easily recognize those percepts, generating self-attributions of the form “I see something red,” “It hurts,” and so on. But the system receives no input from the systems that generate propositional attitude events (like judging and deciding). Consequently, the mindreading system cannot directly self-attribute propositional attitude events; it must infer them by exploiting the perceptual input (together with the outputs of various memory systems). Thus, Carruthers (2009: 124) concludes, “self-attributions of propositional attitude events like judging and deciding are always the result of a swift (and unconscious) process of self-interpretation.” On this perspective, therefore, we do not introspect our own propositional attitude events. Our only form of access to those events is via self-interpretation, turning our mindreading faculty upon ourselves and engaging in unconscious interpretation of our own behavior, physical circumstances, and sensory events like visual imagery and inner speech. Carruthers bases his proposal on considerations to do with the evolution of mindreading and metacognition, the rejection of the above-cited data that according to Nichols & Stich (2003) suggest developmental asynchronies and dissociation between self-attribution and other-attribution, and on evidence about the confabulation of attitudes. Thus, Carruthers develops a very sophisticated version of the symmetrical account of self-knowledge in which the theory-driven mechanisms underlying first- and third-person mindreading can count not only on observations and recollections of one’s own behavior and the circumstances in which it occurs/occurred, but also on the recognition of a multitude of perceptual and quasi-perceptual events.

2. Simulation-Theory

Until the mid-1980s the debate on the nature of mindreading was a debate between the different variants of TT. But in 1986, TT as a whole was impugned by Robert Gordon and, independently, by Jane Heal, who gave life to an alternative which was termed “simulation-theory” (ST). In 1989 Alvin Goldman and Paul Harris began to contribute to this new approach to mindreading. In 2006, Goldman provided the most thoroughly developed, empirically supported defense of a simulationist account of our mentalistic abilities.

According to ST, our third-person mindreading ability does not consist in implicit theorizing but rather in representing the psychological states and processes of others by mentally simulating them, that is, attempting to generate similar states and processes in ourselves. Thus, the same resources that are used in our own psychological states and processes are recycled—usually but not only in imagination—to provide an understanding of psychological states and processes of the simulated target. This has often been compared to the method of Einfühlung exalted by the theorists of Verstehen (see Stueber 2006: 5-19).

In order for a mindreader to engage in this process of imaginative recycling, various information processing mechanisms are needed. The mindreader simulates the psychological etiology of the actions of the target in essentially two steps. First, the simulator generates pretend or imaginary mental states in her own mind which are intended to (at least partly) correspond to those of the target. Second, the simulator feeds the imaginary states into a suitable cognitive mechanism (for example, the decision-making system) that is taken “offline,” that is, it is disengaged from the motor control systems. If the simulator’s decision-making system is similar to the target’s one, and the pretend mental states that the simulator introduces into the decision-making system (at least partly) match the target’s, then the output of the simulator’s decision-making system might reliably be attributed or assigned to the target. On this perspective, there is no need for an internally represented knowledge base and there is no need of a naïve theory of psychology. The simulator exploits a part of her cognitive apparatus as a model for a part of the simulated agent’s cognitive apparatus.

Hence follows one of the main advantages ST is supposed to have over TT—namely its computational parsimony. According to advocates of ST, the body of tacit folk-psychological knowledge which TT attributes to mindreaders imposes too heavy a burden on mental computation. However, such a load will diminish radically if, instead of computing the body of knowledge posited by TT, mindreaders must only co-opt mechanisms that are primarily used online, when they experience a kind of mental state, to run offline simulations of similar states in the target (the argument is suggested by Gordon 1986 and Goldman 1995, and challenged by Stich & Nichols 1992, 1995).

In the early years of the debate over ST, a main focus was on its implications for the controversy between intentional realism and eliminative materialism. Gordon (1986) and Goldman (1989) suggested that by rejecting the assumption that folk psychology is a theory, ST undercuts eliminativism. Stich & Ravenscroft (1994: §5), however, objected that ST undermines eliminativism only provided that the latter adopts the subpersonal version of TT. For ST does not deny the evident fact that human beings have intuitions about the mental, and neither rules out that such intuitions might be systematized by building, as David Lewis suggests, a theory that implies them. Consequently, ST does not refute eliminativism; it instead forces the eliminativist to include among the premises of her argument Lewis’ personal formulation of TT, together with the observation/prediction that the theory implicit in our everyday talk about mental states is or will turn out to be seriously defective.

One of the main objections that theory-theorists raise against ST is the argument from systematic errors in prediction. According to ST errors in prediction can arise either (i) because the predictor’s executive system is different from that of the target, or (ii) because the pretend mental states that the predictor has introduced into the executive system do not match the ones that actually motivate the target. However, Stich & Nichols (1992, 1995; see also Nichols et al. 1996) describe experimental situations in which the participants systematically fail to predict the behavior of targets, and in which it is unlikely that (i) or (ii) is the source of problem. Now, TT can easily explain such systematic errors in prediction: it is sufficient to assume that our naïve theory of psychology lacks the resources required to account for such situations. It is no surprise that a folk theory that is incomplete, partial, and in many cases seriously defective often causes predictive failures. But this option is obviously not available for ST: simulation-driven predictions are “cognitively impenetrable,” that is, they are not affected by the predictor’s knowledge or ignorance about psychological processes (see also Saxe 2005; and the replies by Gordon 2005 and Goldman 2006: 173-4).

More recently, however, a consensus seems to be emerging to the effect that mindreading involves both TT and ST. For example, Goldman (2006) grants a variety of possible roles for theorizing in the context of what he calls “high-level mindreading.” This is the imaginative simulation discussed so far, which is subject to voluntary control, is accessible to consciousness, and involves the ascription of complex mental states such as propositional attitudes. High-level simulation is a species of what Goldman terms “enactment imagination” (a notion that builds on Currie & Ravenscroft’s 2002 concept of “recreative imagination”). Goldman contrasts high-level mindreading to the “low-level mindreading,” which is unconscious, hard-wired, involves the attribution of structurally simple mental states such as face-based emotions (for example, joy, fear, disgust), and relies on simple imitative or mirroring processes (see, for example, Goldman & Sripada 2005). Now, theory definitely plays a role in high-level mindreading. In a prediction task, for example, theory may be involved in the selection of the imaginary inputs that will be introduced into the executive system. In this case, Goldman (2006: 44) admits, mindreading depends on the cooperation of simulation and theorizing mechanisms.

Goldman’s blend of ST and TT (albeit with a strong emphasis on the simulative component) is not the only “hybrid” account of mindreading: for other hybrid approaches, see Botterill & Carruthers (1999), Nichols & Stich (2003), and Perner & Kühberger (2006). And it is right to say that now the debate aims first of all to establish to what extent and in which processes theory or simulation prevails.

a. Simulation with and without Introspection

There is an aspect, however, that makes Goldman’s (2006) account of ST different from other hybrid theories of mindreading, namely the neo-Cartesian priority that he assigns to introspection. On his view, first-person mindreading both ontogenetically precedes and grounds third-person mindreading. Mindreaders need to introspectively access their offline products of simulation before they can project them onto the target. And this, Goldman claims, is a form of “direct access.”

In 1993 Goldman put forward a phenomenological version of the inside access view (see above, §1c), by arguing that introspection is a process of detection and classification of one’s (current) psychological states that does not depend at all on theoretical knowledge, but rather occurs in virtue of information about the phenomenological properties of such states. But in light of criticism (Carruthers 1996; Nichols & Stich 2003), in his 2006 book Goldman has remarkably reappraised the relevance of the qualitative component for the detection of psychological states, pointing out the centrality of the neural properties. Building on Craig’s (2002) account of interoception, as well as Marr’s and Biederman’s computational models of visual object recognition, Goldman now maintains that introspection is a perception-like process that involves a transduction mechanism that takes neural properties of mental states as input and outputs representations in a proprietary code (the introspective code, or the “I-code”). The I-code represents types of mental categories and classifies mental-state tokens in terms of those categories. Goldman also suggests some possible primitives of the I-code. So, for example, our coding of the concept of pain might be the combination of the “bodily feeling” parameter (a certain raw feeling) with the “preference” or “valence” one (a negative valence toward the feeling). Thus, the neural version of the inside access view is an attempt to solve the problem of the recognition of the attitude type, which proved problematic for Nichols and Stich’s representationalist-functionalist approach (see above, §1c). However, since different percept and attitude types are presumably realized in different cerebral areas, each percept or attitude type will depend on a specific informational channel to feed the introspective mechanism. Consequently, Goldman’s theory also seems to be open to the objection of massive dissociability raised to the MM theory (see Engelbert and Carruthers 2010: 247).

Goldman’s primacy of first-person mindreading is, however, rejected by other simulationists. According to Gordon’s (1995, 1996) “radical” version of ST, simulation can occur without introspective access to one’s own mental states. The simulative process begins not with my pretending to be the target, but rather with my becoming the target. As Gordon (1995: 54) puts it, simulation is not “a transfer but a transformation.” “I” changes its referent and the equivalence “I=target” is established. In virtue of this de-rigidification of the personal pronoun, any introspective step is ruled out: one does not first assign a psychological state to oneself to transfer it to the target. Since the simulator becomes the target, no analogical inference from oneself to the other is needed. Still more radically, simulation can occur without having any mentalistic concepts. Our basic competence in the use of utterances of the form “I <propositional attitude> that p” involves not direct access to the propositional attitudes, but only an “ascent routine” through which we express our propositional attitudes in this new linguistic form (see Gordon 2007).

Carruthers has raised two objections to Gordon’s radical ST. First, it is a “step back” to a form of “quasi-behaviorism” (Carruthers 1996: 38). Second, Gordon problematically assumes that our mentalistic abilities are constituted by language (Carruthers 2011: 225-27). In developmental psychology de Villiers & de Villiers (2003) have put forward a constitution-thesis similar to Gordon’s: thinking about mental states comes from internalizing the language with which these states are expressed in the child’s linguistic environment. More specifically, mastery of the grammatical rules for embedding tensed complement clauses under verbs of speech or cognition provides children with a necessary representational format for dealing with false beliefs. However, correlation between linguistic exposure and mindreading does not depend on the use of specific grammatical structures. In a training study Lohman & Tomasello (2003) found that performance on a false-belief task is enhanced by simply using perspective-shifting discourse, without any use of sentential complement syntax. Moreover, syntax is not constitutive of the mentalistic capacities of adults. Varley et al. (2001) and Apperly et al. (2006) provided clear evidence that adults with profound grammatical impairment show no impairments on non-verbal tests of mindreading. Finally, mastery of sentence complements is not even a necessary condition of the development of mindreading in children. Perner et al. (2005) have shown that such mastery may be required for statements about beliefs but not about desires (as in English), for beliefs and desires (as in German), or for neither beliefs nor desires (Chinese); and yet children who learn each of these three languages all understand and talk about desire significantly earlier than belief.

b. Simulation in Low-Level Mindreading

Another argument for a (prevalently) simulationist approach to mindreading consists in pointing out that TT is thoroughly limited to high-level mindreading (essentially the attribution of propositional attitudes), whereas ST is also well equipped to account for forms of low-level mindreading such as the perception of emotions or the recognition of facial expressions and motor intentions (see Slors & Macdonald 2008: 155).

This claim finds its main support in the interplay between ST and neuroscience. In the early 1990s mirror neurons were first described in the ventral premotor cortex and inferior parietal lobe of macaque monkeys. These visuomotor neurons activate not only when the monkey executes motor acts (such as grasping, manipulating, holding, and tearing objects), but also when it observes the same, or similar, acts performed by the experimenter or a conspecific. Although there is only one study that seems to offer direct evidence for the existence of mirror neurons in humans (Mukamel et al. 2010), many neurophysiological and brain imaging investigations support the existence of a human action mirroring system. For example, fMRI studies using action observation or imitation tasks demonstrated activation in areas in the human ventral premotor and parietal cortices assumed to be homologous to the areas in the monkey cortex containing mirror neurons (see Rizzolatti et al. 2002). It should be emphasized that most of the mirror neurons that discharge when a certain type of motor act is performed also activate when the same act is perceived, even though it is not performed with the same physical movement—for example, many mirror neurons that discharge when the monkey grasps food with the hand also activate when it sees a conspecific who grasps food with the mouth. This seems to suggest that mirror neurons code or represent an action at a high level of abstraction, that is, they are receptive not only to a mere movement but indeed to an action.

In 1998, Vittorio Gallese and Goldman wrote a very influential article in which mirror neurons were indicated as the basis of the simulative process. When the mirror neurons in the simulator’s brain are externally activated in observation mode, their activity matches (simulates or resonates with) that of mirror neurons in the target’s brain, and this resonance process retrodictively outputs a representation of the target’s intention from a perception of her movement.

More recently a number of objections have been raised against the “resonance” ST advocated by some researchers that have built on Gallese and Goldman’s hypothesis. Some critics, although admitting the presence of mirror neurons in both non-human and human primates, have drastically reappraised their role in mindreading. For example, Saxe (2009) has argued that there is no evidence that mirror neurons represent the internal states of the target rather than some relatively abstract properties of observed actions (see also Jacob & Jeannerod 2005; Jacob 2008). On the other hand, Goldman himself has mitigated his original position. Unlike Gallese, Keysers & Rizzolatti (2004), who propose mirror systems as the unifying basis of all social cognition, now Goldman (2006) considers mirror neuron activity, or motor resonance in general, as merely a possible part of low-level mindreading. Nonetheless, it is right to say that resonance phenomena are at the forefront of the field of social neuroscience (see Slors & Macdonald 2008: 156).

3. Social Cognition without Mindreading

By the early 21st century, the primacy that both TT and ST assigns to mindreading in social cognition had been challenged. One line of attack has come from philosophers working in the phenomenological tradition, such as Shaun Gallagher, Matthew Ratcliffe, and Dan Zahavi (see Gallagher & Zahavi 2008). Others working more from the analytic tradition, such as Jose Luis Bermúdez (2005, 2006b), Dan Hutto (2008), and Heidi Maibom (2003, 2007) have made similar points. Let’s focus on Bermúdez’ contribution because he offers a very clear account of the kind of cognitive mechanisms that might subserve forms of social understanding and coordination without mindreading (for a brief overview of this literature, see Slors & Macdonald 2008; for an exhaustive examination, see Herschbach 2010).

Bermúdez (2005) argues that the role of high-level mindreading in social cognition needs to be drastically re-evaluated. We must rethink the traditional nexus between intelligent behavior and propositional attitudes, realizing that much social understanding and social coordination are subserved by mechanisms that do not capitalize on the machinery of intentional psychology. For example, a mechanism of emotional sensitivity such as “social referencing” is a form of low-level mindreading that subserve social understanding and social coordination without involving the attribution of propositional attitudes (see Bermúdez 2006a: 55).

To this point Bermúdez is on the same wavelength as simulationists and social neuroscientists in drawing our attention to forms of low-level mindreading that have been largely neglected by philosophers. However, Bermúdez goes a step beyond them and explores cases of social interactions that point in a different direction, that is, situations that involve mechanisms that can no longer be described as mindreading mechanisms. He offers two examples.

(1) In game theory there are social interactions that are modeled without assuming that the agents involved are engaged in explaining or predicting each other’s behavior. In social situations that have the structure of the iterated prisoner’s dilemma, the so-called “tit-for-tat” heuristic simply says: “start out cooperating and then mirror your partner’s move for each successive move” (Axelrod 1984). Applying this heuristic simply requires understanding the moves available to each player (cooperation or defection), and remembering what happened in the last round. So we have here a case of social interaction that is conducted on the basis of a heuristic strategy that looks backward to the results of previous interactions rather than to their psychological etiology. We do not need to infer other players’ reasons; we only have to coordinate our behavior with theirs.

(2) There is another important class of social interactions that involve our predicting and/or explaining the actions of other participants, but in which the relevant predictions and explanations seem to proceed without us having to attribute propositional attitudes. These social interactions rest on what social psychologists call “scripts” (“frames” in artificial intelligence), that is, complex information structures that allow predictions to be made on the basis of the specification of the purpose of some social practice (for example, eating a meal at a restaurant), the various individual roles, and the appropriate sequence of moves.

According to Bermúdez, then, much social interaction is enabled by a suite of relatively simple mechanisms that exploit purely behavioral regularities. It is important to notice that these mechanisms subserve central social cognition (in Fodor’s sense). Nevertheless, they implement relatively simple processes of template matching and pattern recognition, that is, processes that are paradigmatic cases of perceptual processing. For example, when a player A applies the tit-for-tat rule, A must determine what the other player B did in the preceding round. This can be implemented in virtue of a template matching in which A verifies that B’s behavioral pattern matches A’s prototype of cooperation and defection. And also detecting the social roles implicated in a script-based interaction is a case of template matching: one verifies whether the perceived behavior matches one of the templates associated with the script (or the prototype represented in the “frame”).

Bermúdez (2005: 223) notes that the idea that much of what we intuitively identify as central processing is actually implemented by mechanisms of template matching and pattern recognition has been repeatedly put forward by the advocates of the connectionist computationalism, especially by Paul M. Churchland. But unlike the latter, Bermúdez does not carry the reappraisal of the role of propositional attitudes in social cognition to the point of their elimination; he argues that social cognition does not involve high-level mindreading when the social world is “transparent” or “ready-to-hand,” as he says quoting Heidegger’s zuhanden. However, when we find ourselves in social situations that are “opaque,” that is, situations in which all the standard mechanisms of social understanding and interpersonal negotiation break down, it seems that we cannot help but appeal to the type of metarepresentational thinking characteristic of intentional psychology (2005: 205-6).

4. References and Further Reading

a. Suggested Further Reading

  • Apperly, I. (2010). Mindreaders: The Cognitive Basis of “Theory of Mind.” Hove, East Sussex, Psychology Press.
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  • Cundall, M. (2008). “Autism.” In The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy..
  • Davies, M. and Stone, T. (eds.) (1995a). Folk Psychology: The Theory of Mind Debate. Oxford, Blackwell.
  • Davies, M. and Stone, T. (eds.) (1995b). Mental Simulation: Evaluations and Applications. Oxford, Blackwell.
  • Decety, J. and Cacioppo, J. T. (2011). The Oxford Handbook of Social Neuroscience. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Doherty, M. J. (2009). Theory of Mind. How Children Understand Others’ Thoughts and Feelings. Hove, East Sussex, Psychology Press.
  • Dokic, J. and Proust, J. (eds.) (2002). Simulation and Knowledge of Action. Amsterdam, John Benjamins.
  • Gerrans, P. (2009). “Imitation and Theory of Mind.” In G. Berntson and J. T. Cacioppo (eds.), Handbook of Neuroscience for the Behavioral Sciences. Chicago, University of Chicago Press, vol. 2, pp. 905–922.
  • Gordon, R. M. (2009). “Folk Psychology as Mental Simulation.” In E. N. Zalta (ed.), The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2009 Edition).
  • Hutto, D., Herschbach, M. and Southgate, V. (eds.) (2011). Special Issue “Social Cognition: Mindreading and Alternatives.” Review of Philosophy and Psychology 2(3).
  • Kind, A. (2005). “Introspection.” In The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Meini, C. (2007). “Naïve psychology and simulations.” In M. Marraffa, M. De Caro and F. Ferretti (eds.), Cartographies of the Mind. Dordrecht, Kluwer, pp. 283–294.
  • Nichols, S. (2002). “Folk Psychology.” In Encyclopedia of Cognitive Science. London, Nature Publishing Group, pp. 134–140.
  • Ravenscroft, I. (2010). “Folk Psychology as a Theory.”  In E. N. Zalta (ed.), The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2010 Edition).
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  • Saxe, R. (2009). “The happiness of the fish: Evidence for a common theory of one’s own and others’ actions.” In K. D. Markman, W. M. P. Klein and J. A. Suhr (eds.), The Handbook of Imagination and Mental Simulation. New York, Psychology Press, pp. 257–266.
  • Shanton, K. and Goldman, A. (2010). “Simulation theory.” Wiley Interdisciplinary Reviews: Cognitive Science 1(4): 527–538.
  • Stich, S. and Rey, G. (1998). “Folk psychology.” In E. Craig (ed.), Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy. London, Routledge.
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Author Information

Massimo Marraffa
University Roma Tre


Omnipotence is the property of being all-powerful; it is one of the traditional divine attributes in Western conceptions of God. This notion of an all-powerful being is often claimed to be incoherent because a being who has the power to do anything would, for instance, have the power to draw a round square. However, it is absurd to suppose that any being, no matter how powerful, could draw a round square.  A common response to this objection is to assert that defenders of divine omnipotence never intended to claim that God could bring about logical absurdities. This observation about what is not meant by omnipotence does little, however, to clarify just what is meant by that term. Philosophers have therefore attempted to state necessary and sufficient conditions for omnipotence.

These proposed analyses are evaluated by several criteria. First, it must be determined whether the property described by the analysis captures what theologians and ordinary religious believers mean when they describe God as omnipotent, almighty, or all-powerful. Omnipotence is thought to be a quite impressive property. Indeed, the traditional God's omnipotence is one of the attributes that make Him worthy of worship. If, therefore, an analysis implies that certain conceivable beings who are not impressive with respect to their power count as omnipotent, then the analysis is inadequate.

Second, when a particular analysis does seem to be in line with the ordinary use of the term, the next question is whether the property described is self-consistent. For instance, many proposed analyses of omnipotence give inconsistent answers to the question of whether an omnipotent being could create a stone too heavy for it to lift. Third, it is necessary to determine whether omnipotence, so understood, could form part of a coherent total religious view. Some analyses of omnipotence require that an omnipotent being be able to do evil, or to break promises, but God has traditionally been regarded as unable to do these things. It has also been argued that the existence of an omnipotent being would be inconsistent with human freedom. Finally, divine omnipotence is one of the premises leading to the alleged contradiction in traditional religious belief known as the Logical Problem of Evil.

A successful analysis of omnipotence is one which captures the ordinary notion, is free from internal contradiction, and is compatible with the other elements of the religious view in which it is embedded.

Table of Contents

  1. The Self-Consistency of Omnipotence
    1. The Stone Paradox
    2. Voluntarism
    3. Act Theories
    4. Result Theories
    5. Omnipotence and Time
  2. Omnipotence and Necessary Moral Perfection
  3. Omnipotence and Human Freedom
  4. Omnipotence and the Problem of Evil
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Self-Consistency of Omnipotence

a. The Stone Paradox

Could an omnipotent being create a stone too heavy for it to lift? More generally, could an omnipotent being make something it could not control (Mackie 1955: 210)? This question is known as the Paradox of the Stone, or the Paradox of Omnipotence. It appears that answering either “yes” or “no” will mean that the being in question is not omnipotent after all. For suppose that the being cannot create the stone. Then it seems that it is not omnipotent, for there is something that it cannot do. But suppose the being can create the stone. Then, again, there is something it cannot do, namely, lift the stone it has created.

Although the argument is usually initially stated in this form, as it stands it is not quite valid. From the fact that a particular being is able to create a stone it cannot lift, it does not follow that there is in fact something that that being cannot do. It only follows that if the being were to create the stone, then there would be something it could not do. As a result, the paradox is a problem only for necessary omnitemporal omnipotence, that is, for the view that there is a being who exists necessarily and is necessarily omnipotent at every time (Swinburne 1973; Meierding 1980). There is no problem for a being who is only omnipotent at certain times, because the being in question might very well be omnipotent prior to creating the stone (but not after). Furthermore, the stone paradox provides no reason to suppose there could not be a contingently omnitemporally omnipotent being; all the being in question would need to do is to decide not to create the stone, and then it would be omnipotent at every time. Nevertheless, the Stone Paradox is of interest because necessary omnitemporal omnipotence has traditionally been attributed to God.

The Stone Paradox has been the main focus of those attempting to specify exactly what an omnipotent being could, and could not, do. However, even for those who do not wish to insist on necessary omnitemporal omnipotence, a number of questions arise. Could an omnipotent being draw a square circle? Descartes notoriously answered “yes.” However, the Western philosophical and theological traditions have, at least since Aquinas, almost universally given the opposite answer. The view that an omnipotent being could do absolutely anything, even the logically absurd, is known as voluntarism.

Simply rejecting voluntarism does not give an answer to the Stone Paradox. Creating a stone too heavy for its creator to lift is a possible task. Another possible task which an omnipotent being can apparently not perform is coming to know that one has never been omnipotent. For human beings, this is a fairly simple task, but for an omnipotent being it would seem to be impossible. The general problem is this: The fact that it is logically possible that some being perform a specified task (the task itself does not contain a contradiction) does not guarantee that it is logically possible for an omnipotent being to perform that task. Coming to know that one has never been omnipotent is an example of a single task that is logically possible for some being perform, but which is logically impossible for an omnipotent being to perform. The Stone Paradox provides an example of two tasks (creating a stone its creator cannot lift and lifting the stone one has just created) such that each task is logically possible, but it is logically impossible for one task to be performed immediately after the other.

In order to meet these challenges, it is necessary to say something more precise than to simply affirm that an omnipotent being would be able to do whatever is possible. These more precise theories can be divided into two classes: act theories, which say that an omnipotent being would be able to perform any action; and result theories, which say that an omnipotent being would be able to bring about any result.

b. Voluntarism

René Descartes, almost alone in the tradition of Western theology, held that God could do anything, even affirming that “God could have brought it about … that it was not true that twice four make eight” (Descartes 1984-1991: 2:294). If this doctrine is adopted, then the Stone Paradox is dissolved: If an omnipotent being could make contradictions true, then an omnipotent being could make a stone too heavy for it to lift and still lift it (Frankfurt 1964). However, this doctrine is of questionable coherence. To cite just one difficulty, it would seem to follow from the claim that God could make 2 x 4 = 9 that possibly God makes 2 x 4 = 9. However, it is a necessary truth that if God makes 2 x 4 = 9, then 2 x 4 = 9. In standard modal logics, possibly p and necessarily if p then q together entail possibly q, so it seems to follow that possibly 2 x 4 = 9.

Descartes does not accept this consequence, but it is not clear how he can avoid it. It has been suggested that he may be implicitly committed to the rejection of one or more widely accepted modal axioms (Curley 1984). These sorts of absurdities have led to the nearly universal rejection of voluntarism by philosophers and theologians.

c. Act Theories

Once voluntarism is rejected, it is necessary to specify more precisely what is meant by saying that an omnipotent being could do anything. One natural way of doing this is to give a definition of the form:

S is omnipotent =df S can perform any action A such that C

where C specifies some conditions A must satisfy. Such theories of omnipotence may be conveniently referred to as act theories. The simplest (non-voluntarist) act theory is:

(1) S is omnipotent =df S can perform any action A such that A is possible

This act theory deals with the problem of drawing a round square and making 2 x 4 = 9: these are not possible actions. There is some difficulty in saying exactly which acts should count as possible, and this threatens to make the condition too weak. For instance, a being who could perform only physically possible actions would not be omnipotent. The usual response, dating back at least to Aquinas, is to say that an action is possible, in the relevant sense, if and only if it consistent, that is, if it is not self-contradictory.

The Stone Paradox is most effective against act theories. Making a stone one cannot lift is a possible action, so, in order to count as omnipotent according to (1), a being must be able to perform it. However, if any being performs this task then there is a possible task which that being cannot perform immediately afterward, namely, lifting the stone one has just made. It might be objected that this task is not possible for the being in question, but this qualification is not permitted by (1). Definition (1) requires that an omnipotent being should be able to perform any logically possible action, that is, any action which could possibly be performed by any being at all, in any circumstances at all. It is clearly possible that some being perform the action lifting the stone one has just made, so, according to (1), a being who had just performed the action making a stone one cannot lift could not possibly be omnipotent.

This is not a problem for a being who is only contingently omnipotent: such a being might perform the first task, thereby ceasing to be omnipotent, and so be unable to perform the second task, or the being might refrain from performing the first task, and so continue to be omnipotent. However, the Paradox does show that on the contemplated theory no being could be necessarily omnitemporally omnipotent.

It has sometimes been thought that this problem could be solved simply by recognizing that creating a stone an omnipotent being cannot lift is an impossible action, and therefore an omnipotent being need not be able to perform it (Mavrodes 1963). However, this line of objection fails to recognize that, in addition to the impossible action creating a stone an omnipotent being cannot lift, there are also such possible actions as creating a stone one cannot lift and creating a stone its creator cannot lift.

There are further problems. Possible actions also include coming to know that one has never been omnipotent, which, since no one can know falsehoods, no omnipotent being could do. Additionally, this kind of view causes problems for various traditional religious views, such as the assertion by the author of the Epistle to the Hebrews that it is “impossible for God to lie” (Hebrews 6:18) since lying is a possible action.

Medieval philosophers prior to Aquinas often attempted to deal with this problem by claiming that an omnipotent being could perform any action which does not require a defect or infirmity. However, there was very little success in spelling out the meaning of this assertion (Ross 1969: 196-202). Here is a definition which cpatures the basic idea of these Medieval analyses:

(2)   S is omnipotent =df S can perform any action A such that it is logically possible that S does A.

This is similar to the Medieval suggestion since, according to classical theology, God is necessarily without defect or infirmity, so that, if the action A requires a defect or infirmity, (2) does not require that God, in order to count as omnipotent, should be able to do it. However, (2) runs into the famous 'McEar' counter-example (Plantinga 1967: 170; La Croix 1977: 183). Suppose that it is a necessary truth about a certain being, known as McEar, that the only action he performs is scratching his ear. It follows that, if McEar can scratch his ear, he is omnipotent, despite his inability to do anything else. This result is clearly unacceptable.

One response, considered by Alvin Plantinga and advocated by Richard La Croix, is to claim merely that an otherwise God-like being who satisfied this definition would be omnipotent. If the concept of God is otherwise coherent, then this claim is probably true. It also has the benefit of being guaranteed not to create any inconsistencies, for it is built into the definition that God has power only to perform those actions such that it is possible that he perform them. However, to adopt this strategy is to give up on the project of providing a general analysis of omnipotence. Furthermore, this claim, on its own, does not answer the question of the Stone Paradox: is it possible for God to create a stone he cannot lift?

Although not everyone agrees that La Croix's response is satisfactory, it is widely held that the prospects are not good for a consistent general definition or analysis of omnipotence in terms of acts (Ross 1969: 202-210; Geach 1973; Swinburne 1973; Sobel 2004: ch. 9).

d. Result Theories

The main alternatives to act theories of omnipotence are result theories, theories which analyze omnipotence in terms of the results an omnipotent being would be able to bring about. These results are usually thought of as states of affairs or possible worlds. A possible state of affairs is a way the world could be. Philosophers also sometimes recognize impossible states of affairs, that is, ways the world could not be. For instance, the sky's being blue is a possible state of affairs, and John's being a married bachelor is an impossible state of affairs. A possible world is a maximal consistent state of affairs, a complete way the world could be.

Equivalent, or approximately equivalent, result theories can be stated in terms either of states of affairs or of possible worlds. The simplest (non-voluntarist) result theory can be stated, in terms of possible worlds, as follows:

(3) S is omnipotent =df S can bring about any possible world

In other words, for any comprehensive way the world could be, an omnipotent being could bring it about that the world was that way. This account of omnipotence was first clearly laid out and endorsed by Leibniz, who pioneered the philosophical use of the notion of a possible world (Leibniz 1985: sects. 7-8, 52, 416). More recently, James Ross has advocated a similar account, though Ross prefers a formulation in terms of states of affairs (Ross 1969: 210-213):

(4) S is omnipotent =df for every contingent state of affairs p, whether p is the case is logically equivalent to the effective choice, by S, that p

Since every state of affairs must either obtain or not, and since two contradictory states of affairs cannot both obtain, an omnipotent being would have to will some maximal consistent set of contingent states of affairs (Ross 1980: 614), that is, some one possible world. Ross's definition therefore entails Leibniz's.

The Leibniz-Ross theory neatly handles all of the objections raised against act theories. First, the Stone Paradox depends on the existence of reflexive actions, that is, actions whose descriptions refer back to the actor. Although states of affairs can refer to agents, a state of affairs does not have an actor. Thus, the phrase 'there being a stone one cannot lift' fails to specify a state of affairs, since there is no actor for “one” to refer to. In order to specify a state of affairs, it is necessary to replace “one” with some expression that defines which agent or agents cannot lift the stone. However, there being a stone an omnipotent being cannot lift is clearly not a possible state of affairs. An omnipotent being could therefore not bring it about. On the other hand, there being a stone its creator cannot lift is a possible state of affairs, and could be brought about by an omnipotent being, under the Leibniz-Ross theory, for an omnipotent being could bring it about that some other being created a stone which that being could not lift. Therefore, the Stone Paradox is not a problem for the Leibniz-Ross theory.

The Leibniz-Ross theory is likewise invulnerable to the objection regarding coming to know that one is not omnipotent, for, in this theory, an omnipotent being must be essentially omnipotent, and it is not possible that an essentially omnipotent being should come to know that it is not omnipotent. Therefore, as in the stone case, the omnipotent being could bring about someone's coming to know that she is not omnipotent, but not an omnipotent being's coming to know that it is not omnipotent. Finally, no analog to the McEar objection arises for the Leibniz-Ross theory.

While there are no obvious contradictions involved in the Leibniz-Ross theory, there are a number of metaphysical consequences which some have thought odd and, indeed, absurd. First, the Leibniz-Ross theory implies that an omnipotent being exists necessarily. According to Leibniz's formulation, an omnipotent being would be able to actualize any possible world, but it is absurd to suppose that an omnipotent being should actualize a world in which it never existed. It follows that no such world is possible. On Ross's formulation, the obtaining of any state of affairs is logically equivalent to its being chosen by an omnipotent being. Therefore, the obtaining of the state of affairs of no omnipotent being ever existing is logically equivalent to an omnipotent being effectively choosing that no omnipotent being should ever exist, but if no omnipotent being ever exists, then no omnipotent being ever chooses. As a result, the state of affairs of no omnipotent being ever existing cannot possibly obtain (Ross 1969: 213-214). Leibniz and Ross are both proponents of the ontological argument for the existence of God, so they both regard this as a benefit of this theory of omnipotence. Others have, however, found it implausible.

Although many people find it intuitive to suppose that there are possible worlds in which there is no omnipotent being, the Leibniz-Ross theory of omnipotence rules out this possibility. The Leibniz-Ross theory may narrow the space of possible worlds even further, for God, the being Leibniz and Ross believe to be omnipotent, is also supposed to be necessarily morally perfect, and there are worlds which intuitively seem possible which a necessarily morally perfect being could not, it seems, create–for instance, worlds in which the only sentient creatures suffer excruciating pain throughout every moment of their existence. On the Leibniz-Ross theory, if the omnipotent being could not create these worlds, then these worlds are not possible.

Furthermore, the Leibniz-Ross theory entails that an omnipotent being not only cannot create beings it cannot control, but cannot create beings it does not control (Mann 1977). In the Leibniz-Ross theory, an omnipotent being must choose every state of affairs which is to obtain, including all of the choices of its creatures. This is often thought to be a serious threat to human freedom.

All of these concerns with the Leibniz-Ross theory point the same direction: the suggestion that there are logically possible states of affairs which it is nevertheless logically impossible that an omnipotent being, or an omnipotent being who also has the other traditional divine attributes, should actualize. This line of reasoning has led Plantinga to dub the view that God can actualize any possible world “Leibniz's Lapse” (Plantinga 1974: 180-184).

There is disagreement about exactly which, or how many, possible states of affairs cannot possibly be brought about by an omnipotent being. For instance, philosophers disagree about whether the claim that an omnipotent being exists is necessarily true, necessarily false, or contingent. If it is a contingent matter whether an omnipotent being exists, then the state of affairs of no omnipotent being ever existing is possible, but nevertheless cannot possibly be brought about by an omnipotent being. Perhaps the most widely accepted examples, and those Plantinga focuses on, are statements about the free choices of creatures. Plantinga believes that it is logically impossible that any being other than Caesar should bring about the possible state of affairs such as Caesar's freely choosing not to cross the Rubicon, for if Caesar's not crossing the Rubicon had been brought about by some other being (for example, God), then Caesar would not have freely chosen.

If it is accepted that there are some possible states of affairs which it is impossible that an omnipotent being should bring about, a more complicated analysis of omnipotence is needed. An obvious candidate is:

(5)   S is omnipotent =df  S can bring about any state of affairs p such that it is logically possible that S brings about p

However, this brings back the McEar objection, which the Leibniz-Ross theory had escaped. It is essential to McEar that he never bring about anything other than his own scratching of his ear. It is therefore impossible that McEar bring about some other state of affairs. As a result, this definition, once again, wrongly counts McEar as omnipotent, provided only that he is able to scratch his ear. Some philosophers have responded by arguing that there could not possibly be such a being as McEar (Wierenga 1983: 374-375). Others have given up on the project of giving a general analysis of omnipotence (La Croix 1977). Still others have advocated theories of omnipotence which make special accommodation to creaturely freedom (Flint and Freddoso 1983).

An entirely different approach to the problem is advocated by Erik J. Wielenberg (2000). According to Wielenberg, omnipotence cannot be analyzed simply by consideration of which states of affairs an omnipotent being could or could not bring about. Instead, it is necessary to consider why the being could or could not bring them about. Wielenberg proposes the following analysis:

(6) S is omnipotent =df there is no state of affairs p such that S is unable to bring about p at least partially due to lack of power

This analysis avoids attributing omnipotence to McEar since McEar's limitation seems to be at least in part due to lack of power. It also solves the problem of the consistency of God's inability to do evil with omnipotence, since God's inability to do evil is not due to lack of power. Finally, according to Wielenberg, if it is really true that even an omnipotent being could not bring about Caesar's freely choosing not to cross the Rubicon, then this must be due not to lack of power, but to the logic of the situation. The chief limitation of Wielenberg's account is that it makes use of some unanalyzed notions whose analysis philosophers have found quite difficult. These are the notion of lack of power and the notion of one state of affairs obtaining partially due to another state of affairs obtaining. Without analyses of these notions, it is hard to tell whether Wielenberg's analysis is self-consistent and whether it is consistent with other traditional divine attributes.

e. Omnipotence and Time

The Leibniz-Ross theory entails that the exercise of omnipotent power cannot occur within time. This is because, in this view, to exercise omnipotent power is to choose some particular possible world to be actual. To think of such a choice as occurring in time would be to imagine that some possible world could, at some particular time, become actual, having previously been merely possible. This, however, is absurd (Ross 1980: 621). Therefore, on the Leibniz-Ross theory, an omnipotent being can act only atemporally.

The notion of an atemporal action has, however, been found difficult. To give just one example of such a difficulty, it is widely held that acting requires one to be the cause of certain effects. However, many philosophers have also held that it is part of the concept of a cause that it must occur before its effects. Since something atemporal is neither before nor after anything else, there cannot be an atemporal cause, and, therefore, there cannot be an atemporal action.

On the other hand, even apart from the Leibniz-Ross theory, there are difficulties with the notion of being omnipotent at a time. This is because there are contingent states of affairs about the past, but the notion of changing the past is generally agreed to be incoherent (see Time Travel). Thus, omnipotence at a point in time cannot be defined as, for instance, the ability to bring about any contingent state of affairs because, although many past states of affairs are contingent, nothing done in the present, even by an omnipotent being, could possibly bring about a past state of affairs.

Richard Swinburne has proposed an analysis of omnipotence at a point in time based on definition (5) above (Swinburne 1973):

(7) S is omnipotent at time t =df  S is able at t to bring about any state of affairs p such that it is consistent with the facts about what happened before t that, after t, S should bring about p

If the notion of changing the past is incoherent, then (7) does not require that an omnipotent being be able to change the past. However, (7) inherits (5)'s flaw when it comes to McEar: Since it is inconsistent to suppose that McEar (who, by hypothesis, is necessarily such that he only scratches his ear) does something other than scratch his ear, he need not have the power to do anything else in order to count as omnipotent. Additionally, there are well-known problems with specifying which facts are about the past. For instance, consider the fact that the U.S. Declaration of Independence was issued 232 years before President Obama took office. It is difficult to say whether this is a fact about 1776 or about 2008. (Intuitively, it is about both.) In order for (7) to succeed in dealing with the difficulties of temporal omnipotence, there must be a distinction between those facts which are, and those which are not, about the past. However, relational facts like the one under discussion show that it is quite difficult to draw this distinction.

Some philosophers have attempted to meet this difficulty head-on by adopting particular theories of temporal facts (Flint and Freddoso 1983), while others have tried to sidestep the concern by formulating theories of temporal omnipotence which do not require a distinction between past and non-past facts. For instance, Gary Rosenkrantz and Joshua Hoffman advocate the following analysis (Rosenkrantz and Hoffman 1980):

(8) S is omnipotent at t =df  S is able at t to bring about any state of affairs p such that possibly some agent brings about p, and p is unrestrictedly repeatable

Rosenkrantz and Hoffman introduce a number of further qualifications, but the central point of their account is the notion of unrestricted repeatability. Intuitively, an unrestrictedly repeatable state of affairs is one that can obtain, cease to obtain, and then obtain again indefinitely many times, throughout all of history. Mt. Vesuvius's erupting is unrestrictedly repeatable, but Mt. Vesuvius's erupting prior to 1900 is not, since the latter cannot obtain at any time after 1900. Rosenkrantz and Hoffman hold that an omnipotent being could, before 1900, have brought about Mt. Vesuvius's erupting prior to 1900 by, at that time, bringing about Mt. Vesuvius's erupting. After 1900, an omnipotent being could still bring about the latter state of affairs, though not the former. Since the former state of affairs is not unrestrictedly repeatable, the inability to bring it about after 1900 is no bar to a being's counting as omnipotent.

2. Omnipotence and Necessary Moral Perfection

According to the New Testament, “God cannot be tempted with evil” (James 1:13) and it is “impossible for God to lie” (Hebrews 6:18). Traditionally, these divine inabilities are taken quite seriously, and are said to follow from God's attribute of impeccability or necessary moral perfection. According to this view, it is impossible for God to do evil. It seems, however, that no being could be both omnipotent and necessarily morally perfect, since an omnipotent being could do anything, but there are many things a necessarily morally perfect being could not do.

The argument can be formulated as follows (Morriston 2001: 144). Consider some particularly evil state of affairs, E, such as every sentient being suffering excruciating pain throughout its entire existence. Then:

(1)   If any being is necessarily morally perfect, then there is no possible world at which that being brings about E

(2)   If any being is omnipotent, then that being has the power to bring about E

(3)   If any being has the power to bring about E, then there is some possible world at which that being brings about E


(4)   No being is both necessarily morally perfect and omnipotent

Some theists have simply accepted the conclusion, replacing either necessary moral perfection or omnipotence with some weaker property. For instance, Nelson Pike famously argued that, although no being would deserve the title “God” unless that being were morally perfect, there are nevertheless possible worlds in which the being who is in fact God is not morally perfect, and therefore is not God (Pike 1969). Pike's view is, in essence, a rather complicated version of the claim that God is only contingently morally perfect, a view which some have regarded as extremely objectionable from a theological standpoint (Geach 1977).

A number of philosophers who have accepted the incompatibility of omnipotence with necessary moral perfection have regarded the latter as more central to religious notions of God, and have argued that divine omnipotence should therefore be rejected (Geach 1977; Morriston 2001; Funkhouser 2006).

Defenders of the compatibility of omnipotence and necessary moral perfection must deny at least one of the premises of the argument, and, indeed, each of them has been denied. Premise (1) is perhaps the most difficult to reject. To be necessarily morally perfect is to be morally perfect in every possible world, but there seem to be some states of affairs such that bringing them about is inconsistent with moral perfection, and so it seems that if any being is necessarily morally perfect, then there are some states of affairs which that being does not bring about in any possible world. However, defenders of certain sorts of divine command theories of ethics are committed to the claim that God is morally perfect only in a trivial sense, and these views will have the result that (1) is false. If what is morally good depends on God's choice, then, if God chose something else, that something else would be morally good. If this is right, then (1) is false: God could bring about E, but if he did bring about E, then E would be morally good. However, most philosophers regard this line of thought as tending to show the absurdity of these versions of divine command theory, rather than the falsity of (1).

Premise (2) can be rejected by those philosophers who regard omnipotence as the ability to perform any action or bring about any result which is consistent with the actor's nature, as in definitions (2), (5), and (7).  However, these definitions fall prey to the McEar objection and, more generally, open the door to all kinds of limitations on what an omnipotent being can do.

Many philosophers of action take it as an axiom that there are no necessarily unexercised powers (or abilities, or capacities), and (3) is merely an instance of this general principle. Nevertheless, the rejection of (3) is defended by Wielenberg (2000), who argues by means of the following analogy. Suppose that Hercules is “omni-strong” that is, he has sufficient strength to lift stones of any weight. Suppose, however, that a certain stone is too slippery for him to get a grip on. He therefore cannot lift it. Hercules' inability to lift the slippery stone does not count against his omni-strength, since the stone is not too heavy for him, but only too slippery.

In the same way, Wielenberg argues, there are many things which it is not possible for God to do. However, God is omnipotent, since it is not for lack of power that God is unable to do these things, but for other reasons, such as his necessary moral perfection. The aptness of Wielenberg's analogy is still open to dispute, and the principle that there are no necessarily unexercised powers continues to be widely accepted.

3. Omnipotence and Human Freedom

It is sometimes argued that if the existence of an omnipotent agent is possible, then the existence of a non-omnipotent free agent is impossible. According to this line of thought, if Caesar was free, then Caesar, and only Caesar, could have brought about Caesar's freely refraining from crossing the Rubicon. However, if Caesar could have brought about that state of affairs, then it must be a possible state of affairs, and an omnipotent being could therefore bring it about. This, however, cannot be correct, for if someone other than Caesar brought about Caesar's refraining, then Caesar would not have refrained freely. Therefore, an omnipotent being could not bring about this state of affairs. But if even an omnipotent being could not bring it about, then surely Caesar, who is not omnipotent, could not bring it about either. Therefore, Caesar was not free and, by parity of reasoning, neither is any other non-omnipotent agent.

The Leibniz-Ross theory renders the problem even more acute. According to Leibniz, God chooses precisely which possible world will obtain. God, therefore, chooses whether Caesar will cross the Rubicon. However, if someone else chooses what Caesar will do, then Caesar is not free. Similarly, for Ross, Caesar's crossing the Rubicon is logically equivalent to God's effectively choosing that Caesar cross the Rubicon. The choice is up to God. It is therefore not up to Caesar, at least not in the sense which (according to some philosophers) is required for free will.

Neither Leibniz nor Ross finds this objection particularly troubling. According to Leibniz, since it is possible that Caesar freely refrain from crossing the Rubicon, there must be a possible world which represents him as doing so. In making a world actual, God does not in any way change the intrinsic character of that world (Leibniz 1985: sect. 52). As a result, had God brought about that world, Caesar would still have been free. Similarly, Ross suggests that whatever sort of independence from external determination freedom requires, it certainly does not require that the agent's choice be independent of its own logical entailments. However, in his view, God's effectively choosing that the agent so choose is logically equivalent to the agent's so choosing, and so cannot be inconsistent with freedom (Ross 1980: sect. 2).

Compatibilists about free will may be satisfied with the responses given by Leibniz and Ross. Libertarians, however, have generally not been satisfied, and have argued that an omnipotent being need not have the power to bring about such states of affairs as Caesar's freely refraining from crossing the Rubicon. Most of those who have been so concerned have followed an approach developed by Plantinga (1974: ch. 9). This approach hinges on the existence of a class of propositions known as counterfactuals of freedom. A counterfactual of freedom is a statement about what an individual would freely choose if faced with a certain hypothetical circumstance. For instance, the claim, "If Caesar were offered a bribe of fifty talents, he would freely refrain from crossing the Rubicon," is a counterfactual of freedom. Now, suppose that Brutus wants Caesar to freely refrain. If he uses force to prevent Caesar from crossing the Rubicon, then he has not succeeded in bringing it about that Caesar freely refrains, for in this case, Caesar's refraining has been brought about by Brutus and not by Caesar, and so Caesar did not do it freely. This sort of bringing about is known as strongly actualizing. Only Caesar can strongly actualize Caesar's freely refraining from crossing the Rubicon. However, if Brutus knows that if Caesar were offered the bribe, he would freely refrain, then there is a sense in which Brutus can bring it about that Caesar freely refrains: Brutus can strongly actualize the state of affairs Caesar's being offered the bribe, and he knows that if he does this then Caesar will freely refrain. In such a case, Brutus would be said to have weakly actualized Caesar's freely refraining.

According to Plantinga, in order for creatures to be free, it must not be up to anyone else which counterfactuals of freedom are true of them, so even an omnipotent being could not bring it about that particular counterfactuals of freedom are true. However, an omnipotent being could presumably bring it about that it knows the true counterfactuals of freedom (or if the omnipotent being was also essentially omniscient, then it would already know), and it could presumably strongly actualize many of their antecedents, and so weakly actualize a variety of states of affairs in which non-omnipotent beings acted freely. An omnipotent being could not, however, weakly actualize just any possible state of affairs. For instance, if there were no possible circumstance such that, if Caesar were in that circumstance, he would freely refrain from crossing the Rubicon, then even an omnipotent being could not weakly actualize Caesar's freely refraining.

Among those who accept Plantinga's arguments, some have attempted to analyze omnipotence in terms of what an omnipotent being could strongly actualize, and made appropriate qualifications for free actions. It is typically pointed out that it is logically impossible for any being to strongly actualize a state of affairs in which another being makes a free choice, and it suffices for omnipotence that a being be able to strongly actualize those states of affairs which it is logically possible that that being should strongly actualize (Wierenga 1983). This approach, however, runs into McEar-style counterexamples. Others have attempted to analyze omnipotence in terms of what an omnipotent being could weakly actualize. Flint and Freddoso (1983) require that an omnipotent being S be able to weakly actualize any possibly actualized state of affairs which is consistent with the counterfactuals of freedom about beings other than S. However, as Graham Oppy has pointed out, Flint and Freddoso's analysis also seems to make omnipotence too easy, since on Flint and Freddoso's account a being who could not strongly actualize such mundane states of affairs as a five-pound stone's being lifted or a barn's being painted red could turn out to be omnipotent if it was able to weakly actualize them (Oppy 2004, 74-75).

4. Omnipotence and the Problem of Evil

Divine omnipotence is typically used as a key premise in the famous argument against the existence of God known as the Logical Problem of Evil. The argument can be formulated as follows:

(1)   An omnipotent being would be able to bring about any possible world

(2)   Given the opportunity to bring about some world, a morally perfect being would only bring about the best world available to it

(3)   The actual world is not the best possible world


(4)   The actual world was not brought about by a being who is both omnipotent and morally perfect

The argument is here formulated in Leibnizian terms, and Leibniz notoriously rejected premise (3). Premise (2) has also been rejected: some philosophers have denied that there is a unique best possible world and others, most notably Robert Adams, have argued that even if there is such a world, creating it might not be the best course of action (Adams 1972). However, the premise that is of present concern is (1). Although (1) is accepted by Leibniz and Ross, considerations related to necessary moral perfection and human freedom have led many philosophers to reject it. This is the central premise of Plantinga's Free Will Defense against the Logical Problem of Evil (Plantinga 1974, ch. 9): If there are worlds that God, though omnipotent, cannot bring about, then the best possible world might be one of these. If this is so, then, despite being both omnipotent and morally perfect, God would bring about a world which was less than the best, such as, perhaps, the actual world.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew (1972). Must God create the best? Philosophical Review 81 (3):317-332.
  • Aquinas, St. Thomas. 1921 [1274]. The summa theologica of St. Thomas Aquinas. 2nd ed. Trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province. London: Burns Oates & Washbourne.
    • Part 1, Qu. 25, Art. 3 argues that omnipotence should be understood as the ability to do anything that is absolutely possible, that is, that does not imply a contradiction.
  • Cowan, J. L. 1965. The paradox of omnipotence. Analysis 25:102-108.
    • Argues, against Mavrodes 1963, that the Stone Paradox cannot be solved by claiming that God can perform only logically possible tasks.
  • Curley, E. M. 1984. Descartes on the creation of the eternal truths. The Philosophical Review 93:569-597.
  • Descartes, Rene. 1984-1991 [1619-1649]. The philosophical writings of Descartes. Trans. JohnCottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny. 3 vols. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Defends voluntarism, the thesis that God can do literally anything, even draw a round square. See 2:294 (Sixth Replies) and 3:23-26 (letters to Mersenne).
  • Flint, Thomas P., and Alfred J. Freddoso. 1983. Maximal power. In The existence and nature of God, ed. Alfred J. Freddoso. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
    • Combines the apparatus of Plantinga 1974 with an Ockhamist account of foreknowledge to develop a result theory sensitive to issues about time and freedom.
  • Frankfurt, Harry G. 1964. The logic of omnipotence. Philosophical Review 73 (2): 262-263.
    • Points out that if, as Descartes supposed, God can do the logically impossible, then God can create a stone too heavy for him to lift and still lift it.
  • Funkhouser, Eric. 2006. On privileging God's moral goodness. Faith and Philosophy 23 (4): 409-422.
    • Argues that omnipotence is incompatible with necessary moral perfection, and that omnipotence is not a perfection, and therefore should not be attributed to God.
  • Geach, P. T. 1973. Omnipotence. Philosophy 48 (183): 7-20.
    • Considers four theories of omnipotence and argues that they are all unacceptable.
  • La Croix, Richard R. 1977. The impossibility of defining 'omnipotence'. Philosophical Studies 32 (2):181-190.
    • Argues that every possible definition of omnipotence either renders omnipotence inconsistent with traditional divine attributes or falls prey to McEar-style counterexamples. This article is responsible for introducing the name 'McEar.'
  • Leibniz, G. W. 1985 [1710]. Theodicy. Ed. Austin Farrer. Trans. E. M. Huggard. La Salle, Ill.: Open Court.
    • Argues that God's omnipotence consists in his ability to actualize any possible world, but God is impelled by a'moral necessity' to choose the best.
  • Mackie, J. L. 1955. Evil and omnipotence. Mind 64 (254): 200-212.
    • Argues that it is incoherent to suppose that a world containing evil was created by an omnipotent and perfectly good being.
  • Mann, William E. 1977. Ross on omnipotence. International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 8 (2):142-147.
    • Shows that, given Ross's theory of omnipotence (Ross 1969), an omnipotent being cannot freely decide to leave it up to others whether a certain state of affairs should obtain.
  • Mavrodes, George I. 1963. Some puzzles concerning omnipotence. Philosophical Review 72 (2):221-223.
    • Argues that an omnipotent being could not create a stone so heavy he could not lift it, since the notion of a stone too heavy to be lifted by an omnipotent being is incoherent.
  • Meierding, Loren. 1980. The impossibility of necessary omnitemporal omnipotence. International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 11 (1): 21-26.
    • Formalizes Swinburne's argument that only necessary omnitemporal omnipotence is incoherent (Swinburne 1973).
  • Morriston, Wes. 2001. Omnipotence and necessary moral perfection: are they compatible? Religious Studies 37 (2): 143-160.
    • Argues that no being could be both omnipotent and necessarily morally perfect.
  • Oppy, Graham. 2005. Omnipotence. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 71 (1): 58-84.
    • Criticizes several recent theories of omnipotence (Rosenkrantz and Hoffman 1980; Flint and Freddoso 1983; Wierenga 1983) and argues that the God of 'orthodox monotheism' should not be regarded as omnipotent at all.
  • Pike, Nelson. 1969. Omnipotence and God's ability to sin. American Philosophical Quarterly 6 (3):208-216.
    • Argues that the individual who is in fact God is able to sin, but that the sentence 'God sins' is nevertheless necessarily false.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1967. God and other minds: a study of the rational justification of belief in God. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
    • Ch. 7, sect. 2 introduced the 'McEar' counterexample to certain definitions of omnipotence (p. 170).
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1974. The nature of necessity. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Chapter 9 argues that there are possible worlds which God, though omnipotent, cannot actualize.
  • Rosenkrantz, Gary, and Joshua Hoffman. 1980. What an omnipotent agent can do. International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 11 (1): 1-19.
    • Defends a result theory according to which an omnipotent agent can actualize any unrestrictedly repeatable state of affairs.
  • Ross, James F. 1969. Philosophical theology. Indianapolis: Bobbs Merrill.
    • Omnipotence is the topic of chapter 5. After a survey of Scholastic theories of omnipotence, Ross argues that no act theory of omnipotence can succeed. Ross then presents his own theory according to which a being is omnipotent if for any contingent state of affairs p, it is up to that being to choose whether p obtains.
  • Ross, James F. 1980. Creation. Journal of Philosophy 77 (10): 614-629.
    • Further develops, and defends from objections, the account of omnipotence given in Ross 1969. Section 2 answers the objection that Ross's theory leaves no room for human freedom (Mann 1977).
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1973. Omnipotence. American Philosophical Quarterly 10: 231-237.
    • Argues that a result theory can, and an act theory cannot, defeat the Stone Paradox. However, it is conceded that the Paradox shows that no temporal being could be essentially omnipotent.
  • Wielenberg, Erik J. 2000. Omnipotence again. Faith and Philosophy 17 (1): 26-47.
    • Criticizes Wierenga 1983 and Flint and Freddoso 1983 and argues for a result theory according to which there is no state of affairs such that lack of power prevents an omnipotent being from actualizing it.
  • Wierenga, Edward R. 1983. Omnipotence defined. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 43 (3):363-375.
    • Defends a result theory, and argues that a being like McEar is impossible.

Author Information

Kenneth L. Pearce
University of Southern California
U. S. A.

Edmund Husserl: Intentionality and Intentional Content

HusserlEdmund Husserl (1859—1938) was an influential thinker of the first half of the twentieth century. His philosophy was heavily influenced by the works of Franz Brentano and Bernard Bolzano, and was also influenced in various ways by interaction with contemporaries such as Alexius Meinong, Kasimir Twardowski, and Gottlob Frege. In his own right, Husserl is considered the founder of twentieth century Phenomenology with influence extending to thinkers such as Martin Heidegger, Jean-Paul Sartre, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and to contemporary continental philosophy generally. Husserl’s philosophy is also being discussed in connection with contemporary research in the cognitive sciences, logic, the philosophy of language, and the philosophy of mind, as well as in discussions of collective intentionality. At the center of Husserl’s philosophical investigations is the notion of the intentionality of consciousness and the related notion of intentional content (what Husserl first called ‘act-matter’ and then the intentional ‘noema’). To say that thought is “intentional” is to say that it is of the nature of thought to be directed toward or about objects. To speak of the “intentional content” of a thought is to speak of the mode or way in which a thought is about an object. Different thoughts present objects in different ways (from different perspectives or under different descriptions) and one way of doing justice to this fact is to speak of these thoughts as having different intentional contents. For Husserl, intentionality includes a wide range of phenomena, from perceptions, judgments, and memories to the experience of other conscious subjects as subjects (inter-subjective experience) and aesthetic experience, just to name a few. Given the pervasive role he takes intentionality to play in all thought and experience, Husserl believes that a systematic theory of intentionality has a role to play in clarifying and founding most other areas of philosophical concern, such as the theory of consciousness, the philosophy of language, the philosophy of logic, epistemology, and the philosophies of action and value. This article presents the key elements of Husserl’s understanding of intentionality and intentional content, specifically as these are developed in his works Logical Investigations and Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Intentionality: Background and General Considerations
    1. Intentional Content
  2. Logical Investigations
    1. Intentionality in Logical Investigations
      1. Act-Character
      2. Act-Matter
    2. Intentionality, Meaning and Expression in Logical Investigations
      1. Meaning and Expression
      2. Essentially Occasional Expressions: Indexicals
  3. Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy: The Perceptual Noema
    1. Noesis and Noema: Terminology and Ontology
    2. Structural Features of the Noema
    3. Systems of Noemata and Explication
    4. Additional Considerations
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Husserl
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Intentionality: Background and General Considerations

Franz Brentano (1838—1917) is generally credited with having inspired renewed interest in the idea of intentionality, especially in his lectures and in his 1874 book Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint. In this work Brentano is, among other things, concerned to identify the proper sphere or subject matter of psychology. Influenced in various ways by Aristotle’s psychology, by the medieval notion of the intentio of a thought, and by modern philosophical views such as those of Descartes and the empiricists, he identifies intentionality as the mark or distinctive characteristic of the mental. For Brentano this means that every mental phenomenon involves the “intentional inexistence” of an object toward which the mental phenomenon is directed. While every such mental phenomenon has an object, different mental phenomena relate to their objects in different ways depending on whether they are mental acts of presenting something, of judging about something, or of evaluating something as good or bad. Identifying intentionality as the mark of the mental in this way opens up the possibility of studying the mind in terms of its relatedness to objects, the different modes or forms that this relatedness takes (perceiving, imagining, hallucinating, and so forth), and in terms of the relationships that these different modes of intentionality bear to one another (the relationships between presentations, judgments, and evaluations; for example, that every judgment fundamentally depends on a presentation the object of which it is a judgment about). Husserl studied with Brentano from 1884 to 1886 and, along with others such as Alexius Meinong, Kasimir Twardowski, and Carl Stumpf, took away from this experience an abiding interest in the analysis of the intentionality of mind as a key to the clarification of other issues in philosophy.

It is important to note the distinction between intentionality in the sense under discussion here on the one hand and the idea of an intention in the sense of an intelligent agent’s goal or purpose in taking a specific action on the other. The intentionality under consideration here includes the idea of agent’s intentions to do things, but is also much broader, applying to any sort of object-directed thought or experience whatsoever. Thus, while it would be normal to say that “Jack intended to score a point when he kicked the ball toward the goal”, in the sense of ‘intention’ pertinent to Husserl it is equally correct to say that “Jack intended the bird as a blue jay”. This latter being a way of saying that Jack directed his mind toward the bird by thinking of it or perceiving it as a blue jay.

Husserl himself analyzes intentionality in terms of three central ideas: intentional act, intentional object, and intentional content. It is arguably in Husserl’s Logical Investigations that these ideas receive their first systematic treatment as distinct but correlative elements in the structure of thought and experience. This section clarifies these three notions based on Husserl’s main commitments, though not always using his exact terminology.

The intentional act or psychological mode of a thought is the particular kind of mental event that is, whether this be perceiving, believing, evaluating, remembering, or something else. The intentional act can be distinguished from its object, which is the topic, thing, or state of affairs that the act is about. So the intentional state of seeing a white dog can be analyzed in terms of its intentional act, visually perceiving, and in terms of its intentional object, a white dog. Intentional act and intentional object are distinct since it is possible for the same kind of intentional act to be directed at different objects (perceiving a tree vs. perceiving a pond vs. perceiving a house) and for different intentional acts to be directed at the same object (merely thinking about the Eiffel Tower vs. perceiving the Eiffel Tower vs. remembering the Eiffel Tower). At the same time the two notions are correlative. For any intentional mental event it would make no sense to speak of it as involving an act without an intentional object any more than it would to say that the event involved an intentional object but no act or way of attending to that object (no intentional act). The notion of intentionality as a correlation between subject and object is a prominent theme in Husserl’s Phenomenology.

a. Intentional Content

The third element of the structure of intentionality identified by Husserl is the intentional content. It is a matter of some controversy to what extent and in what way intentional content is truly distinct from the intentional object in Husserl’s writings. The basic idea, however, can be stated without too much difficulty.

The intentional content of an intentional event is the way in which the subject thinks about or presents to herself the intentional object. The idea here is that a subject does not just think about an intentional object simpliciter; rather the subject always thinks of the object or experiences it from a certain perspective and as being a certain way or as being a certain kind of thing. Thus one does not just perceive the moon, one perceives it “as bright”, “as half full” or “as particularly close to the horizon”. For that matter, one perceives it “as the moon” rather than as some other heavenly body. Intentional content can be thought of along the lines of a description or set of information that the subject takes to characterize or be applicable to the intentional objects of her thought. Thus, in thinking that there is a red apple in the kitchen the subject entertains a certain presentation of her kitchen and of the apple that she takes to be in it and it is in virtue of this that she succeeds in directing her thought towards these things rather than something else or nothing at all. It is important to note, however, that for Husserl intentional content is not essentially linguistic. While intentional content always involves presenting an object in one way rather than another, Husserl maintained that the most basic kinds of intentionality, including perceptual intentionality, are not essentially linguistic. Indeed, for Husserl, meaningful use of language is itself to be analyzed in terms of more fundamental underlying intentional states (this can be seen, for example, throughout LI, I). For this reason characterizations of intentional content in terms of “descriptive content” have their limits in the context of Husserl’s thought.

The distinction between intentional object and intentional content can be clarified based on consideration of puzzles from the philosophy of language, such as the puzzle of informative identity statements. It is quite trivial to be told that Mark Twain is Mark Twain. However, for some people it can be informative and cognitively significant to learn that Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens. The notion of intentional content can be used to explain this. When a subject thinks about the identity statement asserting that Mark Twain is Mark Twain, the subject thinks about Mark Twain in the same way (using the same intentional content; perhaps “the author of Huckleberry Finn”) in association with the name on both the left and right sides of the identity, whereas when a subject thinks about the identity statement asserting that Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens what he learns is that different intentional contents (those associated with the names ‘Mark Twain’ and ‘Samuel Clemens’ respectively) are true of the same intentional object. Cases such as this both motivate the distinction between intentional content and intentional object and can be explained in terms of it.

The notion of intentional content as distinct from intentional object is also important in relation to the issue of thought about and reference to non-existent objects. Examples of this include perceptual illusions, thought about fictional objects such as Hamlet or Lilliput, thought about impossible objects such as round-squares, and thought about scientific kinds that turn out not to exist such as phlogiston. What is common to each of these cases is that it seems possible to have meaningful experiences, thoughts and beliefs about these things even though the corresponding objects do not exist, at least not in any ordinary sense of ‘exist’. Identifying intentional content as a distinct and meaningful element of the structure of intentionality makes it possible for Husserl to explain such cases of meaningful thought about the non-existent in a way similar to that of Gottlob Frege and different from the strategy of his fellow student of Brentano, Alexius Meinong. Approaching issues of intentionality from the perspective of logic and the philosophy of language, Frege handled such cases by drawing a distinction between the sense or meaning and the referent (object denoted) of a term, and then saying that non-referring terms such as ‘Ulysses’ have senses, but no referents (Frege 1948). Meinong, on the other hand, was driven by his commitment to the thesis of intentionality to posit a special category of objects, the non-existing objects or objects that have Nichtsein, as the intentional objects of such thoughts (Meinong 1960). For Husserl, such cases involve an intentional act and intentional content where the intentional content does present an intentional object, but there is no real object at all corresponding to the intentional appearance. Given this, one way of reading the distinction between intentional content and intentional object is as a generalization to all mental acts of Frege’s primarily linguistic distinction between the senses and the referents of terms and sentences (for a defense of this interpretation see Føllesdal 1982, while for discussion and resistance to the view, see Drummond 1998). Husserl’s exact understanding of the ontological situation regarding intentional objects is quite involved and undergoes some changes between Logical Investigations and his later phenomenology, beginning with Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy. However, throughout his work Husserl is able to make use of the distinction between intentional content and intentional object to handle cases of meaningful thought about the non-existent without having to posit, in Meinongian fashion, special categories of non-existent objects.

The basic structure of Husserl’s account of intentionality thus involves three elements: intentional act, intentional content and intentional object. For Husserl, the systematic analysis of these elements of intentionality lies at the heart of the theory of consciousness, as well as, in varying ways, of logic, language and epistemology.

2. Logical Investigations

Logical Investigations (hereafter ‘Investigations’), which came out in two volumes in the years 1900 and 1901, represents Husserl’s first definitive treatment of intentionality and is the source of the main ideas that would drive much of his later philosophical thinking. The primary project of the Investigations is to criticize a view in the philosophy of logic called “psychologism” according to which the laws of logic are in some sense natural laws or rules governing the human mind and can thus be studied empirically by psychology. Husserl, notably in agreement with Frege, believed that this view had the undesirable consequences of treating the laws of logic as contingent rather than necessarily true and as being empirically discoverable rather than as known and validated a priori. In the first part of the Investigations, the “Prolegomena to Pure Logic”, Husserl systematically criticizes the psychologistic view and proposes to replace it with his own conception of “pure logic” as the a priori framework for organizing, understanding and validating the results of the formal, natural and social sciences (Husserl called the “theory of scientific theory in general” that pure logic was to be the foundation for ‘Wissenschaftslehre’). For Husserl, pure logic is an a priori system of necessary truths governing entailment and explanatory relationships among propositions that does not in any way depend on the existence of human minds for its truth or validity. However, Husserl maintains that the task of developing a human understanding of pure logic requires investigations into the nature of meaning and language, and into the way in which conscious intentional thought is able to comprehend meanings and come to know logical (and other) truths. Thus the bulk of a work that is intended to lay the foundations for a theory of logic as a priori, necessary, and completely independent of the composition or activities of the mind is devoted precisely to systematic investigations into the way in which language, meaning, thought, and knowledge are intentionally structured by the mind. While this tension is more apparent than real, it was a major source of criticism directed against the first edition of Logical Investigations, one which Husserl was concerned to clarify and defend himself against in his subsequent writings and in the second edition of the Investigations in 1913. Pertinent here is what Husserl had to say about language and expression (LI, I) and about intentionality itself (LI, V & VI).

a. Intentionality in Logical Investigations

In Logical Investigations Husserl developed a view according to which conscious acts are primarily intentional, and a mental act is intentional only in case it has an act-quality and an act-matter. Introducing this key distinction, Husserl writes:

The two assertions ‘2 x 2 = 4’ and ‘Ibsen is the principal founder of modern dramatic realism’, are both, qua assertions, of one kind; each is qualified as an assertion, and their common feature is their judgment-quality. The one, however, judges one content and the other another content. To distinguish such ‘contents’ from other notions of ‘content’ we shall speak here of the matter (material) of judgment. We shall draw similar distinctions between quality and matter in the case of all acts (LI, V § 20, p. 586).

An additional notion in the Investigations, which grows in importance in Husserl’s later work and will be discussed here, is the act-character. Husserl views act-quality, act-matter and act-character as mutually dependent constituents of a concrete particular thought. Just as there cannot be color without saturation, brightness and hue, so for Husserl there cannot be an intentional act without quality, matter and character. The quality of an act (called ‘intentional act’ above) is the kind of act that it is, whether perceiving, imagining, judging, wishing, and so fotrth. The matter of an act is what has been called above its intentional content, it is the mode or way in which an object is thought about, for example a house intended from one perspective rather than another, or Napoleon thought of first as “the victor at Jena”, then as “the vanquished at Waterloo”. The character of an act can be thought of as a contribution of the act-quality that is reflected in the act-matter. Act-character has to do with whether the content of the act, the act-matter, is posited as existing or as merely thought about and with whether the act-matter is taken as given with evidence (fulfillment) or without evidence (emptily intended). The next two sub-sections deal with act-character and act-matter respectively.

i. Act-Character

In the Investigations and in his later work, Husserl sometimes writes of an additional dimension in the analysis of intentionality, which he first calls the “act-character” and then in later writings the “doxic and ontic modalities” (For the former, see for example LI, VI § 7; for the latter, see Ideas, Chapter 4 particularly §§ 103—10). In the Investigations, act-character includes such things as whether the intentional act is merely one of reflecting on a possibility (a “non-positing act”) or one of judging or asserting that something is the case (a “positing act”), as well as the degree of evidence that is available to support the intention of the act as fulfilled or unfulfilled (as genuinely presenting some object in just the way that the act-matter suggests, or not). It seems clear that the character of an act is ultimately traceable to the act-quality, since it has to do with the way in which an act-matter is thought about rather than with what that act-matter itself presents. However, it is a contribution of the act-quality that casts a shadow or a halo around the matter, giving the content of the act a distinctive character. This becomes clearer through consideration of particular cases.

Consider first positing and non-positing acts. When a subject wonders whether or not the train will be on time, the content or act-matter of her intention is that of the train being on time. However, in this case the subject is not positing that the train will be on time, but merely reflecting on this in a non-committal (“non-positing”) way as a possibility. The same difference is present in the case of merely wondering whether Bob is the murderer on the one hand (non-positing act), and forming the firm judgment that he is on the other (positing act) (on positing and non-positing acts, see LI, V §§ 38—42).

The character of an intentional act also has to do with whether it is an “empty” merely signitive intention or whether it is a “non-empty” or fulfilled intention. Here what is at issue is the extent to which a subject has evidence of some sort for accepting the content of their intention. For example, a subject could contemplate, imagine or even believe that “the sun set today will be beautiful with few clouds and lots of orange and red colors” already at eleven in the morning. At this point the intention is an empty one because it merely contemplates a possible state of affairs for which there is no intuitive (experiential) evidence. When the same subject witnesses the sun set later in the day, her intention will either be fulfilled (if the sunset matches what she thought it would be like) or unfulfilled (if the sun set does not match her earlier intention). For Husserl, the difference here too does not have to do with the content or act-matter itself, but rather with the evidential character of the intention (LI VI, §§ 1—12).

Importantly, the distinctions between positing and non-positing acts on the one hand and between empty and fulfilled intentions on the other are separate. It would be possible for a subject to posit the existence of something for which she had no evidence or fulfillment (perhaps the belief that her favorite candidate will win next year’s election), just as it would be possible for a subject to not posit or affirm something for which she did have fulfillment or evidence (such as refraining from believing that water causes sticks immersed in it to bend, in spite of immediate perceptual information supporting this).

ii. Act-Matter

As noted above, the matter of an intentional act is its content: the way in which it presents the intentional object as being. The act-matter is:

that element in an act which first gives it reference to an object, and reference so wholly definite that it not merely fixes the object meant in a general way, but also the precise way in which it is meant. (LI, V § 20, p. 589, italics Husserl’s)

So the act-matter both determines to what object, if any, a thought refers, and determines how the thought presents that object as being. For Husserl, the matter of an intentional act does not consist of only linguistic descriptive content. The notion of act-matter is simply that of the significant object-directed mode of an act, and can be perceptual, imaginative, or memorial, linguistic or non-linguistic, particular and indexical, or general, context-neutral and universal. This makes intentionality and intentional content (act-matter) the fundamental targets of analysis, with the theory of language and expression to be analyzed in terms of these notions rather than the other way around. Husserl is thus committed to the notion that intentionality is primary and language secondary, and so also to the view that meaningful non-linguistic intentional thought and experience are both possible and common (LI, I §§ 9—11, 19, & 20).

Husserl’s understanding of the metaphysics of act-matter is also important. Motivated by his anti-psychologism he wants to treat meanings as objective and independent of the minds of particular subjects. Because of this Husserl views meanings in the Investigations as “ideal species”, a kind of abstract entity akin to a universal. However, having done this Husserl also needs to explain how it is that these abstract meanings can play a role in the intentional thought of actual subjects. Husserl’s solution to this is to say that meanings are ideal species or kinds of act-matter that are then instantiated in the actual act-matter of particular intentional subjects when they think the relevant thoughts. Thus, just as there is an ideal species or universal for shape, which gets instantiated in particular instances of shaped objects in the world, so there is an ideal species or universal of the act-matter “2+2=4”, which gets instantiated in the act-matter of a particular subject when he thinks this thought. Whereas Fregean accounts deal with the fact that one individual can have the same thought at different times and different individuals can think about the same thing at any time by positing a single abstract sense that is the numerically identical content of all of their thoughts, Husserl views particular act-matters or contents as instances of ideal act-matter species. Thus, on Husserl’s view, two subjects are able to think about the same thing in the same way when both of them instantiate exactly similar instances of a single kind of content or act-matter. Thus if John and Sarah are both thinking about how they would like to see the Twins win the 2008 World Series in baseball, they are having the same thought and thinking about the same objects in virtue of instantiating exactly similar act-matter instances of the single act-matter species “the Twins win the 2008 World series in baseball” (LI, I §§ 30—4, V §§ 21 & 45).

b. Intentionality, Meaning and Expression in Logical Investigations

Largely motivated by his concern with developing a pure logic, Husserl devotes the entire first Logical Investigation, “Meaning and Expression”, to an analysis of issues of language, linguistic meaning and linguistic reference. Husserl’s discussion here is systematic and wide ranging, covering many issues that are also of concern to Frege in his analysis of language and that have continued to spur discussion in the philosophy of language up to the present. These include the distinction between linguistic types and tokens, the distinction between words and sentences and the meanings that these express, the distinction between sentence meaning and speaker meaning, the meaning and reference of proper names and the function of indexicals and demonstratives. As noted above, Husserl takes the intentionality of thought to be fundamental and the meaning-expressing and reference fixing capabilities of language to be parasitic on more basic features of intentionality. Here the main features of Husserl’s intentionality-based view of language are discussed.

i. Meaning and Expression

Husserl is interested in analyzing the meaning and reference of language as part of his project of developing a pure logic. This leads him to focus primarily on declarative sentences from ordinary language, rather than on other kinds of potentially meaningful signs (such as the way in which smoke normally indicates or is a sign of fire) and gestures (such as the way in which a grimace might indicate or convey that someone feels pain or is uncomfortable). Husserl thus uses ‘expression’ to refer to declarative sentences in natural language and to parts thereof, such as names, general nouns, indexicals,and so forth (LI, I §§ 1—5).

Husserl maintains that the meaning of an expression cannot be identical to the expression for two reasons. First, expressions in different languages, such as ‘the cat is friendly’ and ‘il gatto è simpatico’ are linguistically different, but have the same meaning. Additionally, the same linguistic expression, such as ‘I am going to the bank’ can have different meanings on different occasions (due in this case to the ambiguity of the word ‘bank’). Thus sameness of word or linguistic expression is neither necessary nor sufficient for sameness of meaning (LI, I §§ 11 & 12).

Husserl also maintains that the meaning of a linguistic expression cannot be identical with its referent or referents. In support of this Husserl appeals to phenomena such as informative identity statements and meaningful linguistic expressions that have no referent, among others. An example of the first sort of case would be Frege’s famous ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’, where ‘Hesperus’ means “the evening star” and ‘Phosphorus’ means “the morning star”. Both ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ refer to the planet Venus and so if the meaning of a term just is the object that it refers to, then anyone who knows that Hesperus is Hesperus should also know that Hesperus is Phosphorus, yet clearly this is not the case. Husserl’s own explanation for this would be that a subject who found ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ informative would do so because he associated different act-matters or intentional contents with each of these names. Thus Husserl, like Frege, distinguishes the meaning of a term or expression both from that term itself and from the object or objects to which the term refers. Husserl identifies these distinctive linguistic meanings as kinds of intentional act-matter (LI, I §§ 13 & 14).

In the Investigations Husserl describes the normal use of an expression, such as ‘the weather is cool today’, in the following way. A subject who utters this expression to a companion is in an intentional state, which includes an act-matter or intentional content that presents the weather as being cool today. This act-matter instantiates an ideal species or act-matter type “the weather is cool today” and in virtue of doing so directs the utterer’s attention to the actual state of affairs regarding the weather. It is in virtue of these facts about the utterer’s intentional states that the words express, for him, the meaning that they do (which is not, of course, to rule out the possibility of miscommunication; for Husserl the description here is just the standard case). The subject performing the utterance does, in principle, three things for his interlocutor. First, the subject’s utterance “expresses” the ideal meaning “the weather is cool today”. Second, assuming the interlocutor grasps that this is what is being expressed, her attention will itself be directed to the referent of this ideal sense, namely the state of affairs involving the weather today (her act-matter will then also instantiate the relevant ideal act-matter species). Third, the subject will, in making his utterance, “intimate” to his interlocutor that he has certain beliefs or is undergoing certain mental states or experiences. This last point is very important for Husserl. He maintains that in normal cases what a subject intimates in uttering an expression (that he believes that the weather is cool today or that he fears that his country will intervene) is not part of the meaning of that expression, even though it is something that the interlocutor will be able to understand on the basis of the subject’s utterance. It is only in cases where a subject is making an assertion about his experiences, attitudes or mental states (such as ‘I doubt that things will improve this year’) that expressed meaning and intimated meaning coincide (on intimation, see LI, I §§ 7 & 8; the majority of the points summarized here are in the first chapter of LI, I, which is §§ 1—16).

ii. Essentially Occasional Expressions: Indexicals

Husserl recognized clearly the need for a distinction between what he called “objective” expressions on the one hand, and those that are “essentially occasional” on the other. An example of an objective expression would be a statement concerning logic, mathematics or the sciences whose meaning is fixed regardless of the context in which it is used (for example ‘The Pythagorean Theorem is a theorem of geometry’ or ‘7+5=12’). An example of an essentially occasional expression would be a sentence such as ‘I am hungry’, which seems to in some sense change its meaning on different occasions of utterance, depending on who is speaking. According to Husserl, essentially occasional expressions include both indexicals (‘I’, ‘you’, ‘here’, ‘now’, and so forth) and demonstratives (‘this’, ‘that’ , and so forth). Such expressions have two facets of meaning. The first is what Husserl calls a constant “semantic function” associated with particular indexical expressions. For example, “It is the universal semantic function of the word ‘I’ to designate whoever is speaking…” (LI, I §26, p. 315). Husserl recognizes, however, that the sentences expressing these semantic functions cannot simply be substituted for indexicals without affecting the meaning of sentences containing them. A subject who believes “whoever is now speaking is hungry” effectively has an existentially quantified belief to the effect that the person, whoever he or she is, who is now speaking is hungry. In order to capture what such a subject would mean when he says ‘I am hungry’ it is necessary to somehow make it clear that the individual quantified over is indeed the person now speaking, but there seems to be no way to do this other than to re-insert the indexical ‘I’ itself in the sentence. This makes it necessary to identify a second facet or component of indexical content.

To deal with this, Husserl proposes a distinction between the semantic function or “indicating meaning” of indexicals, which remains constant from use to use, and the “indicated” meaning of indexicals, which is fundamentally cued to certain features of the speaker and context of utterance. Thus the “indicating meaning” of ‘I’ is always “whoever is now speaking”, but the indicated meaning of its use on a given occasion is keyed to the “self-awareness” or “self-presentation” of the speaker on that occasion. In general, the indicating meaning of an indexical will specify some general relationship between the utterance of a sentence and some feature of the speaker’s conscious awareness or perceptually given environment, while the indicated meaning will be determined by what the speaker is actually aware of in the context in which the sentence is uttered. In the case of many indexicals, such as ‘you’ and ‘here’ their indicating meaning may be supplied in part by demonstrative pointing to features of the immediate perceptual environment. Thus, Husserl writes, “The meaning of ‘here’ is in part universal and conceptual [semantic function/indicating meaning], inasmuch as it always names a place as such, but to this universal element the direct place-presentation [indicated meaning] attaches, varying from case to case” (LI I § 26, pp. 317—18). Husserl thus has a relatively clear understanding of some of the key issues surrounding indexical thought and reference that have been recently discussed in the work of philosophers of language such as John Perry (1977, 1979), as well as an account of how indexical thought and reference works. The question of whether or not this account is adequate to resolve all of the issues raised by contemporary discussions of indexicals and demonstratives, however, is one that goes beyond the scope of this article (for discussion of this issue in Husserl’s philosophy see Smith and McIntyre 1982, pp. 194—226).

3. Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy: The Perceptual Noema

In the year 1913 Husserl published both a revised edition of Logical Investigations and the Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy (hereafter, Ideas). Between the first publication of the Investigations and the works of 1913 the main transition in Husserl’s thought is a change in emphasis from the primary project of laying the foundations of a pure a priori logic to the primary project of developing a systematic phenomenology of consciousness with the theory of intentionality at its core. In the Ideas, Husserl proposes the systematic description and analysis of first person consciousness, focusing on the intentionality of this consciousness, as the fundamental first step in both the theory of consciousness itself and, by extension, in all other areas of philosophy as well. With hints of the idea already present in the first edition of Logical Investigations, by 1913 Husserl has come to see first person consciousness as epistemologically and so logically prior to other forms of knowledge and inquiry. Whereas Descartes took his own conscious awareness to be epistemically basic and then immediately tried to infer, based on his knowledge of this awareness, the existence of a God, an external world, and other knowledge, Husserl takes first-person conscious awareness as epistemically basic and then proposes the systematic study of this consciousness itself as a fundamental philosophical task. In order to lay the foundations for this project Husserl proposes a methodology known as the phenomenological reduction.

The phenomenological reduction involves performing what Husserl calls the epoché, which is carried out by “bracketing”, setting in abeyance, or “neutralizing” the existential thesis of the “natural attitude”. The idea behind this is that most people most of the time do not focus their attention on the structure of their experience itself but rather look past this experience and focus their attention and interests on objects and events in the world, which they take to be unproblematically real or existent. This assumption about the unproblematic existence of the objects of experience is the “existential thesis” of the natural attitude. The purpose of the epoché is not to doubt or reject this thesis, but simply to set it aside or put it out of play so that the subject engaging in phenomenological investigation can reorient the focus of her attention to her experiences qua experiences and just as they are experienced. This amounts to a reorienting of the subject’s intentional focus from the natural to the phenomenological attitude. A subject who has performed the epoché and adopted the phenomenological attitude is in a position to objectively describe the features of her experience as she experiences them, the phenomena. Questions of the real existence of particular objects of experience and even of the world or universe themselves are thus set aside in order to make way for the systematic study of first person conscious experience (Ideas, §§ 27—32; Natanson 1973, chapters 2 & 3).


Distinct from the phenomenological reduction, but important for the project of Husserl’s Phenomenology as a whole, is what is sometimes called the “eidetic reduction”. The eidetic reduction involves not just describing the idiosyncratic features of how things appear to one, as might occur in introspective psychology, but focusing on the essential characteristics of the appearances and their structural relationships and correlations with one another. Husserl calls insights into essential features of kinds of things “eidetic intuitions”. Such eidetic intuitions, or intuitions into essence, are the result of a process Husserl calls ‘eidetic’ or ‘free’ variation in imagination. It involves focusing on a kind of object, such as a triangle, and systematically varying features of that object, reflecting at each step on whether the object being reflected upon remains, in spite of its altered feature(s), an instance of the kind under consideration. Each time the object does survive imaginative feature alteration that feature is revealed as inessential, while each feature the removal of which results in the object intuitively ceasing to instantiate the kind (such as addition of a fourth side to a triangle) is revealed as a necessary feature of that kind. Husserl maintained that this procedure can incrementally reveal elements of the essence of a kind of thing, the ideal case being one in which intuition of the full essence of a kind occurs. The eidetic reduction compliments the phenomenological reduction insofar as it is directed specifically at the task of analyzing essential features of conscious experience and intentionality. The considerations leading to the initial positing of the distinction between intentional act, intentional object and intentional content would, according to Husserl, be examples of this method at work and of some of its results in the domain of the mental. Whereas the purpose of the phenomenological reduction is to disclose and thematize first person consciousness so that it can be described and analyzed, the purpose of the eidetic reduction is to focus phenomenological investigations more precisely on the essential or invariant features of conscious intentional experience. (Ideas, §§ 34 & 69—71; Natanson 1973, chapter 4).

There is much debate about the exact significance, especially metaphysical and epistemological, of Husserl’s shift in focus and introduction of the methodology of the phenomenological reduction in the Ideas. Important here is that the notions of intentionality and intentional content remain central to Husserl’s project and so many of the descriptions and results of the Investigations remain relevant for the Ideas. However, Husserl does both modify and expand his views about intentionality, as well as the kinds of analyses of it that he pursues. Whereas in the Investigations Husserl was interested in intentionality specifically in relation to the project of laying the foundations for pure logic, in the Ideas he is interested in giving a systematic account of the ways in which intentionality structures, “constitutes”, and so makes possible all types of cognition, including the awareness of self, time, physical objects, mathematical objects, an intersubjective social world and many other things besides. The sections that follow concentrate on the core ideas concerning intentionality and intentional content from the Ideas, leaving many of these other areas out of consideration.

a. Noesis and Noema: Terminology and Ontology

One change between the Investigations and the Ideas is that Husserl began using the term ‘noesis’ to refer to intentional acts or “act-quality” and ‘noema’ (plural ‘noemata’) to refer to what, in the Investigations had been referred to as “act-matter”. Husserl does not simply change his terminology, however. This change in terminology coincides with an apparent change in metaphysical understanding of the relationship between the noema as an ideal meaning and the particular mental activities of actual subjects, and also with a much more intense interest in analyzing the different elements of the noema, as well as understanding its relationships, both temporal and semantic, to other noemata.

Metaphysically the main change is that Husserl seems to abandon the model of meanings as ideal species that get instantiated in the act-matters of particular subjects in favor of a more direct correlative relationship between the noesis (intentional acts) and the noemata (their objects). In Ideas it is noemata themselves that are the objects of intentional thought, that are graspable and repeatable and that, according to Husserl, are not parts of the intentional acts of conscious subjects. It is a point of interpretative and philosophical contention whether the noema, as Husserl understood it, is better viewed as a sort of abstract Fregean sense that mediates between the subjective noetic acts of individual thinkers and the objective referents of their thoughts (Føllesdal 1982, Smith and McIntyre 1982), or whether the noema is better seen as the object of intentional thought itself as viewed from a particular perspective (Drummond 1990). While the difference between these two interpretations may seem rather small, they are actually quite different in terms of their metaphysical commitments and in terms of the particular issues of meaning, reference, and epistemology that they are able to resolve or be challenged by. For a general introduction and overview see the introduction to (Smith and Smith 1995) and for more detailed discussion of some of the main differences see (Dreyfus and Hall 1982, Zahavi 1994, Drummond 2003). No attempt will be made to resolve this interpretative dispute here, though it is worth noting that the question of the metaphysical status of the noesis, the noema, and the intentional object (if indeed this is to be viewed as a distinct entity in Husserl’s ontology) is in part complicated by Husserl’s methodological procedure of bracketing questions of existence.

b. Structural Features of the Noema

In the Ideas Husserl identifies three central features of the noema, focusing especially on the case of perception. Husserl first distinguishes between a component of sense or descriptive content on the one hand (accounting for the mode of presentation or description under which the object is intended), and a core component standing for or presenting the very identity of the object intended, a sort of pure “X” as Husserl calls it, underlying the various contents or noemata that are correlated with a single object of thought. What Husserl is focusing on here is the idea that to be conscious of an object is not just to be conscious of something under one description or way of viewing it, but it is also to be conscious of the object as an identity of its own, one that is simultaneously given through discrete noematic perspectives or experiences, but is also more than what any one of these experiences presents it as being. When Husserl says that there is a noematic “core” or underlying “X” in the noema, what he means is that when we think of an object we always think of it as an entity with its own identity as well as an object as it appears to us or is thought of by us. Related to this point, Husserl maintains that the intention of an object via a certain noema at one moment involves, not only intending the object as it is currently experienced, but also contains a third element consisting of pointing references to a “horizon” of further possible determinations of the object, to further noemata or ways of being directed to one and the same object that are either motivated by or consistent with the way in which the current intention presents that object. The structure of the noema is thus quite complex, consisting of a noematic core, some descriptive or presentational content, and a horizon containing pointing references to other possible ways (noemata) of experiencing one and the same identical object (some of the most definitive sections on noesis and noema are Ideas, §§ 128—35, however the concepts are first introduced over two chapters from §§ 76—96).

Consider the perceptual experience of a red barn in a field in southeastern Wisconsin. The intentional content or noema of this experience will provide immediate awareness of one side or profile of the barn, perhaps intended as a barn, or perhaps just intended as a structure of some sort. This will be the descriptive sense or content of the intention. However, in this very perception the barn is not experienced as merely a facet or a two-dimensional stretch of color in space. Rather, it is experienced as a three dimensional object possessing other sides, parts and properties, and capable of being explored, investigated and determined, in short intended with regard to each of these further features. The barn, as an object of perception, transcends the information that can be given regarding it, the intention of it that can be made via any given noema, and this fact is a feature that is already intended in the very first thought a subject has about the barn. This is what is meant by the term ‘horizon’ or ‘noematic horizon’. From the first experience, the subject already has a sense of how to go about further determining, further intending and experiencing the object of thought, in this case, the barn. Perhaps the current experience is of the front side of the barn as being red; then this very experience includes as part of its “noematic horizon” the intention that the barn must also have a back side of some sort, and that this side of the barn, along with its color (perhaps it also is red, or perhaps grey, but at any rate it must have some color) can be experienced if the subject walks around to it and looks. In each further experience of the barn, in each further determination of it in thought, it is one and the same barn that is itself given, one and the same definite identity or object “X” that underlies all of the particular presentations of the same object, and that unites them in a “synthesis of identity” to provide a continuous and, ideally, unbroken series of further determinations of the same object, of further intentional experiences in which more is “filled in” or determined about the way the object actually is. Regarding such a system of experiences of the same object, Husserl says,

…There is inherent in each noema a pure object-something as a point of unity and, at the same time, we see how in a noematic respect two sorts of object-concepts are to be distinguished: this pure point of unity, this noematic “object simpliciter,” and the “object in the How of its determinations”—including undeterminednesses which for the time being “remain open” and, in this mode, are co-meant. (Ideas, § 131, p. 314)

Here, the “point of unity” is the underlying core of intended object identity “X”, the “object in the How of its determinations” is the descriptive content or sense, and the “undeterminednesses” constitute the horizon of the current content. Thus, it is possible to distinguish, phenomenologically speaking, between the way in which the object is intended via a particular noema or sense, and the seemingly transcendent self-identical object that is intended, and which is the ultimate determinant of the accuracy or inaccuracy, truth or falsity of the intentions that are directed toward it. While this distinction between the descriptive content and the identical X in a noema is phenomenologically real, this does not mean that these are “really separable” parts of the content in such a way that it would be possible to experience the one in the absence of the other. Indeed, Husserl explicitly denies this possibility.

c. Systems of Noemata and Explication

This conception of the noema, as divided into a descriptive sense and the pure X or identity of the object intended via the sense, leads Husserl to the view that, phenomenologically speaking, it is possible to view an object (the underlying X) as determining a system of possible senses (noemata) or intentions of it, each of which is both (a) about that very same object and (b) able to be consciously recognized as about the same determinable X as the others when they are experienced in a sequence. Thus, in the example of the barn already discussed, a subject might begin by looking at it from the front and focusing on its color. This would be the first noema intending the very object X, the barn perceptually before one, as red. The subject could then go on to have further perceptual intentions of the barn by walking around it. Each time the subject shifts her perspective on or reconceptualizes the object of her thought, she entertains a new content or noema, a new possible way in which the barn can be experienced as being. If the barn is indeed the way she conceptualizes and experiences it, then that thought, that possibility is fulfilled by her ongoing experience. At each step the subject integrates her current experience with the previous one, identifying the X at the core of the current experience with the X at the core of the previous ones, and is at the same time directed toward new possible ways of filling out her experience of the barn in the horizon of the noema (for example by walking around it some more, or by going inside); Husserl refers to this process as a “synthesis of identity”. During the course of this “explication” of the horizon of the noema, it is always possible that some future experience will reveal the ones that have come before to have been in some fundamental way incorrect. For example, if the subject upon walking around to the back side of the barn discovers that it is really not a barn at all, but only a cleverly positioned façade, the original system of intentional experiences she had regarding it will be frustrated and a new system of intentions will begin.

Nevertheless, the idea that a single numerically identical object can be conceived, phenomenologically speaking, as the correlate of systems of contents or noemata all experienceable as directed towards one and the same object X gives rise, for Husserl, to the idea of an object as, phenomenologically speaking, the correlate of a complete set of such experiences. As Husserl puts it, using ‘perfect givenness’ to suggest the ideally possible experience of having gone through all of the possible correct intentions with regard to a given object:

But perfect givenness is nevertheless predesignated as “Idea” (in the Kantian sense)—as a system which, in its eidetic type, is an absolutely determined system of endless processes of continuous appearings, or as a field of these processes, an a priori determined continuum of appearances with different, but determined, dimensions, and governed throughout by a fixed set of eidetic laws…This continuum is determined more precisely as infinite on all sides, consisting of appearances in all its phases of the same determinable X so ordered in its concatenations and so determined with respect to the essential contents that any of its lines yields, in its continuous course, a harmonious concatenation (which itself is to be designated as a unity of mobile appearances) in which the X, given always as one and the same, is more precisely and never “otherwise” continuously-harmoniously determined. (Ideas, § 143, p. 342)

Here, then, we have what amounts to an analysis of the object of an intention considered from a phenomenological perspective. To be an object, phenomenologically speaking, is to be the correlate of a complete maximally consistent system of noematic senses, all synthesizable as directed towards one and the same underlying substrate or object X. This idea itself is given rise to by the three crucial features of the structure of definite intentional content that have been discussed here: the descriptive sense, the core content “X”, and the horizon of possible future experiences of one and the same object

David W. Smith and Ronald McIntyre have further developed Husserl’s account of the horizon of a noema at some length, and propose a distinction between kinds of possible further determinations of the object of a given thought that are predelineated in the horizon of a given noema (1982, pp. 246—56). It is possible to distinguish between (i) possible determinations that are motivated by the current noema or intentional content, (ii) possible determinations that are consistent with but not motivated by the current noema, and (iii) possible determinations that are neither motivated by nor consistent with the current noema. If a subject is intending a given object perceived from a particular side as a barn, then the motivated further determinations in the horizon will include further experiences of that same object as a barn: walking around it will reveal more barn-like sides, going inside will reveal that it is or has been used for certain purposes, more closely examining the material the walls are made of will reveal that they are not papier-mâché, and so forth. Now, there will still be divergent motivated possibilities. For example, barns can be made of either wood, or aluminum, or some combination of these with stone or of some other materials entirely, and they can also have many different colors, designs and particular interior layouts. Nevertheless, what makes each of these possibilities motivated is the fact that it is consistent with the object intended being exactly the kind of thing that it is currently intended as.

By contrast, a possible determination that is consistent with but unmotivated by the current perception of a barn as a barn is that the subject walks around to the back and discovers that the barn is really just a wooden barn façade erected to stimulate tourism in the area. This possible further experience is not totally inconsistent with a current experience of something as a barn, though it is not a motivated possibility relative to such an experience either. Finally, an experience that is neither motivated by nor consistent with the intention of an object as a barn would be the discovery that the current object is merely a complicated video image, or that it is some kind of new and heretofore undiscovered life form that just happens to look exactly like a barn when it is resting. A discovery such as this is, arguably, not even present in the horizon of the original noema to begin with. Husserl referred to experiences where the previously intended identity of an experienced object is entirely cancelled by some current experience as cases where the object intended “explodes”, and where it is unclear that the subject was really thinking about the object actually before her at all even if she was succeeding in referring to it in some minimal sense of the term (Ideas, §§ 138 & 151).

d. Additional Considerations

Husserl’s understanding of the noema in the Ideas retains the explanatory features (in terms of theory of language and its ability to resolves puzzles about meaningful reference to the non-existent, informative identity statements, and so forth) of Logical Investigations account while also incorporating a more nuanced analysis of the structure of intentional content itself and a more holistic understanding of how the intentional content (noema) that a subject is thinking at a given moment is interconnected with other features of that subject’s actual and possible experience (the systems of noemata).

In the Investigations Husserl retains an understanding of the “act-character” of an intentional event as being its quality of positing or not positing the existence of its object and of being evidentially empty or fulfilled. Referring to these characters as “modalities” of belief (“doxic” modalities) and experience, Husserl recognizes both the already identified modalities pertaining to beliefs and also additional “ontic” modalities pertaining to whether a subject takes the content of their intention to be necessary or merely possible, valuable or worthless, beautiful or ugly. The key feature of these noematic characters or modalities is that they are characteristics of thought and experience that affect its overall meaning for the subject but that are not, strictly speaking, represented in the content of the intention (the noema) itself.

The notions of empty and fulfilled intentions in conjunction with Husserl’s understanding of the noematic horizon and of systems of possible interrelated object-experiences allow him to continue the epistemological investigations begun earlier in the Sixth Logical Investigation along two major lines.

The first is the idea that the mere unfulfilled intention of an object or state of affairs, by its nature, dictates certain conditions of fulfillment or conditions under which the thought merely entertained in the current intention would be given with full and complete evidence or intuition. For example, the emptily intended thought of a beautiful sunset with lots of red and gold today has as its primary fulfillment conditions the direct perceptual intuition of a sunset matching in all relevant ways the content that it currently intends emptily. Husserl maintains that intentional beliefs and thoughts involving many different kinds of objects (physical objects, other minds, mathematical objects or proofs, abstract objects, scientific theories) all have fulfillment conditions that dictate what kinds of experiences and thought processes are necessary to bring them to evidential groundedness. Already in Logical Investigations Husserl saw this task as an essential contribution that phenomenology could make to epistemology and the theory of evidence and he continues to carry it out in the final chapters of the Ideas and in his later works.

The second idea that comes into its own with Husserl’s Phenomenology and understanding of the structure of intentionality is the idea of “constitution analysis” (Ideas, §§ 149—53). Husserl’s basic idea here is that consciousness of each kind of object of thought and experience, and of each noetic mode of being aware of the objects of experience (perception, introspection, reflection, imagination, reasoning, and so forth) is the result of a complex interworking of other intentional acts. However, some ways of thinking and experiencing are more basic or fundamental, while others depend or are founded on these basic intentions in very specific ways. As a simple example, the act of judging that something is the case presupposes some other act in which the idea or possibility of this thing’s being the case has been made available. It would be impossible to judge that something is (or is not the case) without a prior act familiarizing one with its existence or possibility in the first place. Husserl views awareness of complex intentional objects as the result of those objects having been “constituted” out of or on the basis of a series of more basic intentional states (Husserl usually identifies the most basic intentional experiences with various aspects of perception and introspection). Thus, a full phenomenological analysis of the cognition of a given kind of complex object, mathematical cognition, for example, will involve an analysis of the different kinds of intentional experiences and operations that underlie and so constitute the complex intentionality in question.

Of particular importance for Husserl in this connection is the notion of “categorial intuition”. In categorial intuition a subject becomes conscious of an articulated state of affairs as the object of her intention. Categorial intuition involves, for example, not just passive awareness of a ship, or just paying attention to particular parts or features of the ship, but rather intending the articulated complex state of affairs that is “the ship’s having two smokestacks” or “the ship’s being about to enter port”. It is intentional awareness of such facts that forms the basis of categorial judgments, and the intentional contents of categorial acts can be understood along the lines of propositions, the relations among and analysis of which is the subject matter of logic. In the present context, what is important is that the intentionality involved in categorial intuition is a complex intentionality built up out of more basic kinds of intentions and intentional transformations, and thus another key example of a phenomena requiring constitution analysis (LI, §§ 40—58). To the extent that understanding the factors that go into forming a belief or intention is relevant to evaluating the epistemic status of that belief, constitution analysis functions together with the analysis of evidence and fulfillment conditions and so comprises a part of Phenomenology’s contribution to epistemology.

It must also be noted, however, that constitution analysis within Phenomenology has an interest entirely independent of the role it plays in epistemology. This interest is that of providing a comprehensive analysis of the essential kinds of intentionality and relationships among them that are involved in making possible different kinds of complex intentional thoughts and experiences. As mentioned already, such constitution analyses include analysis of the constitution of time-consciousness, the constitution of mathematical object awareness, the constitution of bodily awareness, the constitution (subjective and inter-subjective) of the social world, and so forth.

The foregoing considerations go beyond the scope of what would normally be considered a discussion of Husserl’s views specifically on intentionality and intentional content. Hopefully they serve, however, to provide some sense of the interconnection between Husserl’s views concerning intentionality and the other parts of his philosophy.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Husserl

The collected works of Husserl were published in 1950, in Husserliana: Edmund Husserl — Gesammelte Werke, The Hague/Dordrecht: Nijhoff/Kluwer. The following are works by Husserl listed in the chronological order of their German publications (the German publication date is in brackets).

  • [LI] Logical Investigations, trans. J. N. Findlay, London: Routledge [1900/01; 2nd, revised edition 1913], 1973.
    • [Cited in the text as: LI, Investigation # (I, II, etc.) section # (§), and, where quotes are used, page #].
  • “Philosophy as Rigorous Science,” trans. in Q. Lauer (ed.), Phenomenology and the Crisis of Philosophy, New York: Harper [1910], 1965.
  • [Ideas] Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy — First Book: General Introduction to a Pure Phenomenology, trans. F. Kersten. The Hague: Nijhoff [1913], 1982.
    • [Cited in the text as: Ideas, section # (§), and, where quotes are used, page #].
  • On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893-1917), trans. J. B. Brough, Dordrecht: Kluwer [1928], 1990.
  • Formal and Transcendental Logic, trans. D. Cairns. The Hague: Nijhoff [1929], 1969.
  • Cartesian Meditations, trans. D. Cairns, Dordrecht: Kluwer [1931], 1988.
  • The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Philosophy, trans. D. Carr. Evanston: Northwestern University Press [1936/54], 1970.
  • Experience and Judgement, trans. J. S. Churchill and K. Ameriks, London: Routledge [1939], 1973.

b. Secondary Sources

The following works are secondary sources pertinent to Husserl’s views on intentionality and the role that it plays in his phenomenology.

  • Brentano, Franz. Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint, ed. and trans. by L. L. McAlister. London: Routledge, 1973.
    • Brentano’s classic work on intentionality as the mark of the mental. A central influence on Husserl.
  • Dreyfus, Hubert L., and Harrison Hall. Husserl, Intentionality, and Cognitive Science. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1982.
    • A classic anthology collecting essays on the relationship of Husserl’s philosophy to cognitive science. This text also includes a number of contributions concerning the correct interpretation of the noema.
  • Drummond, John. “The Structure of Intentionality.” In Welton ed. The New Husserl: A Critical Reader. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2003.
    • A comprehensive overview of the main features of Husserl’s conception of intentionality.
  • Drummond, John. “From Intentionality to Intensionality and Back.” Etudes Phenomenologiques 27—28 (1998): 89—126.
    • An analysis of Husserl’s views on intentionality that situates them in their historical context with other members of the Brentano School and attempts to shed some light on the motivations for different interpretations of the noema or intentional content.
  • Drummond, John. Husserlian Intentionality and Non-Foundational Realism. Dodrecht: Kluwer, 1990.
    • A thorough discussion of Husserl’s views including a lengthy exposition and defense of the view that sees the intentional noema as an abstract aspect of the intentional object rather than as a distinct sense.
  • Føllesdal, Dagfinn. “Noema and Meaning in Husserl.” Phenomenology and Philosophical Research, 50 (1990): 263—271.
  • Føllesdal, Dagfinn. “Husserl’s Notion of Noema” in Dreyfus (ed.) 1982.
    • Føllesdal’s articles are considered the classic statement of the “Fregean” interpretation of the noema.
  • Gottlob Frege. “On Sense and Reference.” In Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, P. Geach and M. Black (eds. and trans.), Oxford: Blackwell, third edition, 1980.
    • The classic source for the distinction between sense and reference and its application to issues of language and, by extension, intentionality.
  • Gurwitsch, Aron. “Husserl’s Theory of the Intentionality of Consciousness.” In Dreyfus (ed.) 1982.
    • A distinctive interpretation of the intentional object as consisting of systems of noemata.
  • Kern, Iso. "The Three Ways to the Transcendental Phenomenological Reduction." Husserl: Expositions and Appraisals. Eds. Frederick Elliston and Peter McCormick. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1977.
    • A discussion of the phenomenological reduction and of different motivations that lead Husserl to it.
  • Alexius Meinong. 1960, “On the Theory of Objects,” in Roderick Chisholm (ed.), Realism and the Background of Phenomenology, Glencoe, Ill.: Free Press, 76–117
    • A detailed account of the different kinds of existent and non-existent objects that Meinong recognized as categories in his ontology, as well as some discussion of the relationship of these to the intentionality of mind.
  • Mohanty, Jitendranath & McKenna, William (eds). Husserl’s Phenomenology: A Textbook. Lanham: University Press of America, 1989.
    • A collection of essays covering numerous aspects of Husserl’s thought, including his views on intentionality.
  • Mohanty, Jitendranath. Husserl and Frege. Studies in Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1982.
    • A comparison of Husserl and Frege’s views, including their views on psychologism and on the distinction between sense and referent.
  • Natanson, Maurice Alexander. Edmund Husserl; Philosopher of Infinite Tasks. Evanston Ill.: Northwestern University Press, 1973.
    • A very accessible introduction Husserl’s Phenomenology, including helpful discussion of the phenomenological reduction and the natural attitude in the early chapters.
  • Perry, John. “The Problem of the Essential Indexical.” Nous 13.1 (1979): 3—21.
  • Perry, John. “Frege on Demonstratives.” The Philosophical Review, 86.4 (1977): 474—97.
    • Classic articles on the semantics of indexicals and demonstratives.
  • Pietersma, Henry. Phenomenological Epistemology. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • A thorough discussion of the epistemological views of Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty.
  • Smith, Barry, and David Woodruff Smith. The Cambridge Companion to Husserl. Cambridge; New York: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • A collection of essays on various aspects of Husserl’s philosophy. The introduction includes a helpful discussion of divergent interpretations of the noema.
  • Smith, Barry. Austrian Philosophy: The Legacy of Franz Brentano. Chicago and LaSalle, Illinois: Open Court Press, 1994.
    • Includes discussion of the background and broader context against which Husserl developed his views of intentionality, including the views Brentano, Meinong, Stumpf, Twardowski and others.
  • Smith, David Woodruff, and Ronald McIntyre. Husserl and Intentionality: A Study of Mind, Meaning, and Language. Synthese Library; V. 154. Dordrecht, Holland: D. Reidel Pub. Co., 1982.
    • A very thorough study. The early parts of the text are a clear introduction to Husserl on language and intentionality, while the rest defends a version of the “Fregean” interpreation of the noema and develops a possible worlds understanding of intentionality based on this.
  • Sokolowski, Robert (ed.). Edmund Husserl and the Phenomenological Tradition. Washington: Catholic University of America Press, 1988.
    • Essays on various aspects of Husserl’s philosophy, including intentionality.
  • Zahavi, Dan, ed. Internalism and Externalism in Phenomenological Perspective. Special Issue: Synthese, 160. 2008.
    • A special issue containing essays by six philosophers addressing various aspects of the relationship between Husserl’s Phenomenology and contemporary discussions of semantic internalism and externalism.
  • Gallagher, Shaun, and Zahavi, Dan. The Phenomenological Mind: an Introduction to Phenomenology and Cognitive Science. London: Routledge, 2008.
    • An introduction to Phenomenology and intentionality, including intersections of these ideas with contemporary cognitive science.
  • Zahavi, Dan. "Husserl's Noema and the Internalism-Externalism Debate." Inquiry 47 (2004): 42-66.
    • A discussion of the relationship between Husserl’s Phenomenology and the semantic internalism-externalism debate, the article also includes discussion of the main differences between competing interpretations of the noema within Husserl scholarship.
  • Zahavi, Dan. Husserl’s Phenomenology. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2003.
    • A comprehensive discussion of Husserl’s Phenomenology, including issues of intentionality and intentional content.


Author Information

Andrew D. Spear
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.

American Enlightenment Thought

Although there is no consensus about the exact span of time that corresponds to the American Enlightenment, it is safe to say that it occurred during the eighteenth century among thinkers in British North America and the early United States and was inspired by the ideas of the British and French Enlightenments.  Based on the metaphor of bringing light to the Dark Age, the Age of the Enlightenment (Siècle des lumières in French and Aufklärung in German) shifted allegiances away from absolute authority, whether religious or political, to more skeptical and optimistic attitudes about human nature, religion and politics.  In the American context, thinkers such as Thomas Paine, James Madison, Thomas Jefferson, John Adams and Benjamin Franklin invented and adopted revolutionary ideas about scientific rationality, religious toleration and experimental political organization—ideas that would have far-reaching effects on the development of the fledgling nation.  Some coupled science and religion in the notion of deism; others asserted the natural rights of man in the anti-authoritarian doctrine of liberalism; and still others touted the importance of cultivating virtue, enlightened leadership and community in early forms of republican thinking. At least six ideas came to punctuate American Enlightenment thinking: deism, liberalism, republicanism, conservatism, toleration and scientific progress. Many of these were shared with European Enlightenment thinkers, but in some instances took a uniquely American form.

Table of Contents

  1. Enlightenment Age Thinking
    1. Moderate and Radical
    2. Chronology
    3. Democracy and the Social Contract
  2. Six Key Ideas
    1. Deism
    2. Liberalism
    3. Republicanism
    4. Conservatism
    5. Toleration
    6. Scientific Progress
  3. Four American Enlightenment Thinkers
    1. Franklin
    2. Jefferson
    3. Madison
    4. Adams
  4. Contemporary Work
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Enlightenment Age Thinking

The pre- and post-revolutionary era in American history generated propitious conditions for Enlightenment thought to thrive on an order comparable to that witnessed in the European Enlightenments.   In the pre-revolutionary years, Americans reacted to the misrule of King George III, the unfairness of Parliament (“taxation without representation”) and exploitative treatment at the hands of a colonial power: the English Empire.  The Englishman-cum-revolutionary Thomas Paine wrote the famous pamphlet The Rights of Man, decrying the abuses of the North American colonies by their English masters.  In the post-revolutionary years, a whole generation of American thinkers would found a new system of government on liberal and republican principles, articulating their enduring ideas in documents such as the Declaration of Independence, the Federalist Papers and the United States Constitution.


Although distinctive features arose in the eighteenth-century American context, much of the American Enlightenment was continuous with parallel experiences in British and French society.  Four themes recur in both European and American Enlightenment texts: modernization, skepticism, reason and liberty. Modernization means that beliefs and institutions based on absolute moral, religious and political authority (such as the divine right of kings and the Ancien Régime) will become increasingly eclipsed by those based on science, rationality and religious pluralism.  Many Enlightenment thinkers—especially the French philosophes, such as Voltaire, Rousseau and Diderot—subscribed to some form of skepticism, doubting appeals to miraculous, transcendent and supernatural forces that potentially limit the scope of individual choice and reason.  Reason that is universally shared and definitive of the human nature also became a dominant theme in Enlightenment thinkers’ writings, particularly Immanuel Kant’s “What is Enlightenment?” and his Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals.  The fourth theme, liberty and rights assumed a central place in theories of political association, specifically as limits state authority originating prior to the advent of states (that is, in a state of nature) and manifesting in social contracts, especially in John Locke’s Second Treatise on Civil Government and Thomas Jefferson’s drafts of the Declaration of Independence.  

a. Moderate and Radical

Besides identifying dominant themes running throughout the Enlightenment period, some historians, such as Henry May and Jonathan Israel, understand Enlightenment thought as divisible into two broad categories, each reflecting the content and intensity of ideas prevalent at the time.  The moderate Enlightenment signifies commitments to economic liberalism, religious toleration and constitutional politics.   In contrast to its moderate incarnation, the radical Enlightenment conceives enlightened thought through the prism of revolutionary rhetoric and classical Republicanism.  Some commentators argue that the British Enlightenment (especially figures such as James Hutton, Adam Ferguson and Adam Smith) was essentially moderate, while the French (represented by Denis Diderot, Claude Adrien Helvétius and François Marie Arouet) was decidedly more radical.  Influenced as it was by the British and French, American Enlightenment thought integrates both moderate and radical elements.

b. Chronology

American Enlightenment thought can also be appreciated chronologically, or in terms of three temporal stages in the development of Enlightenment Age thinking.  The early stage stretches from the time of the Glorious Revolution of 1688 to 1750, when members of Europe’s middle class began to break free from the monarchical and aristocratic regimes—whether through scientific discovery, social and political change or emigration outside of Europe, including America.  The middle stage extends from 1751 to just a few years after the start of the American Revolution in 1779. It is characterized by an exploding fascination with science, religious revivalism and experimental forms of government, especially in the United States.  The late stage begins in 1780 and ends with the rise of Napoléon Bonaparte, as the French Revolution comes to a close in 1815—a period in which the European Enlightenment was in decline, while the American Enlightenment reclaimed and institutionalized many of its seminal ideas.  However, American Enlightenment thinkers were not always of a single mind with their European counterparts.  For instance, several American Enlightenment thinkers—particularly James Madison and John Adams, though not Benjamin Franklin—judged the French philosophes to be morally degenerate intellectuals of the era.

c. Democracy and the Social Contract

Many European and American Enlightenment figures were critical of democracy.  Skepticism about the value of democratic institutions was likely a legacy of Plato’s belief that democracy led to tyranny and Aristotle’s view that democracy was the best of the worst forms of government.  John Adams and James Madison perpetuated the elitist and anti-democratic idea that to invest too much political power in the hands of uneducated and property-less people was to put society at constant risk of social and political upheaval.  Although several of America’s Enlightenment thinkers condemned democracy, others were more receptive to the idea of popular rule as expressed in European social contract theories.  Thomas Jefferson was strongly influenced by John Locke’s social contract theory, while Thomas Paine found inspiration in Jean-Jacques Rousseau’s.  In the Two Treatises on Government (1689 and 1690), Locke argued against the divine right of kings and in favor of government grounded on the consent of the governed; so long as people would have agreed to hand over some of their liberties enjoyed in a pre-political society or state of nature in exchange for the protection of basic rights to life, liberty and property.  However, if the state reneged on the social contract by failing to protect those natural rights, then the people had a right to revolt and form a new government. Perhaps more of a democrat than Locke, Rousseau insisted in The Social Contract (1762) that citizens have a right of self-government, choosing the rules by which they live and the judges who shall enforce those rules. If the relationship between the will of the state and the will of the people (the “general will”) is to be democratic, it should be mediated by as few institutions as possible.

2. Six Key Ideas


At least six ideas came to punctuate American Enlightenment thinking: deism, liberalism, republicanism, conservatism, toleration and scientific progress. Many of these were shared with European Enlightenment thinkers, but in some instances took a uniquely American form.

a. Deism

European Enlightenment thinkers conceived tradition, custom and prejudice (Vorurteil) as barriers to gaining true knowledge of the universal laws of nature.  The solution was deism or understanding God’s existence as divorced from holy books, divine providence, revealed religion, prophecy and miracles; instead basing religious belief on reason and observation of the natural world.   Deists appreciated God as a reasonable Deity.  A reasonable God endowed humans with rationality in order that they might discover the moral instructions of the universe in the natural law.  God created the universal laws that govern nature, and afterwards humans realize God’s will through sound judgment and wise action.  Deists were typically (though not always) Protestants, sharing a disdain for the religious dogmatism and blind obedience to tradition exemplified by the Catholic Church.  Rather than fight members of the Catholic faith with violence and intolerance, most deists resorted to the use of tamer weapons such as humor and mockery.

Both moderate and radical American Enlightenment thinkers, such as James Madison, Benjamin Franklin, Alexander Hamilton, John Adams and George Washington, were deists.   Some struggled with the tensions between Calvinist orthodoxy and deist beliefs, while other subscribed to the populist version of deism advanced by Thomas Paine in The Age of Reason.  Franklin was remembered for stating in the Constitutional Convention that “the longer I live, the more convincing proof I see of this truth—that God governs in the affairs of men.”  In what would become known as the Jefferson Bible (originally The Life and Morals of Jesus of Nazareth), Jefferson chronicles the life and times of Jesus Christ from a deist perspective, eliminating all mention of miracles or divine intervention.  God for deists such as Jefferson never loomed large in humans’ day-to-day life beyond offering a moral or humanistic outlook and the resource of reason to discover the content of God’s laws.  Despite the near absence of God in human life, American deists did not deny His existence, largely because the majority of the populace still remained strongly religious, traditionally pious and supportive of the good works (for example monasteries, religious schools and community service) that the clergy did.

b. Liberalism

Another idea central to American Enlightenment thinking is liberalism, that is, the notion that humans have natural rights and that government authority is not absolute, but based on the will and consent of the governed.  Rather than a radical or revolutionary doctrine, liberalism was rooted in the commercial harmony and tolerant Protestantism embraced by merchants in Northern Europe, particularly Holland and England.  Liberals favored the interests of the middle class over those of the high-born aristocracy, an outlook of tolerant pluralism that did not discriminate between consumers or citizens based on their race or creed, a legal system devoted to the protection of private property rights, and an ethos of strong individualism over the passive collectivism associated with feudal arrangements. Liberals also preferred rational argumentation and free exchange of ideas to the uncritical of religious doctrine or governmental mandates.  In this way, liberal thinking was anti-authoritarian.  Although later liberalism became associated with grassroots democracy and a sharp separation of the public and private domains, early liberalism favored a parliamentarian form of government that protected liberty of expression and movement, the right to petition the government, separation of church and state and the confluence of public and private interests in philanthropic and entrepreneurial endeavors.

The claim that private individuals have fundamental God-given rights, such as to property, life, liberty and to pursue their conception of  good, begins with the English philosopher John Locke, but also finds expression in Thomas Jefferson’s drafting of the Declaration of Independence.  The U.S. Bill of Rights, the first ten amendments to the Constitution, guarantees a schedule of individual rights based on the liberal ideal.  During the constitutional convention, James Madison responded to the anti-Federalists’ demand for a bill of rights as a condition of ratification by reviewing over two-hundred proposals and distilling them into an initial list of twelve suggested amendments to the Constitution, covering the rights of free speech, religious liberty, right to bear arms and habeas corpus, among others.  While ten of those suggested were ratified in 1791, one missing amendment (stopping laws created  by Congress to increase its members’ salaries from taking effect until the next legislative term) would have to wait until 1992 to be ratified as the Twenty-seventh Amendment.  Madison’s concern that the Bill of Rights should apply not only to the federal government would eventually be accommodated with the passage of the Fourteenth Amendment (especially its due process clause) in 1868 and a series of Supreme Court cases throughout the twentieth-century interpreting each of the ten amendments as “incorporated” and thus protecting citizens against state governments as well.

c. Republicanism

Classical republicanism is a commitment to the notion that a nation ought to be ruled as a republic, in which selection of the state’s highest public official is determined by a general election, rather than through a claim to hereditary right.  Republican values include civic patriotism, virtuous citizenship and property-based personality.  Developed during late antiquity and early renaissance, classic republicanism differed from early liberalism insofar as rights were not thought to be granted by God in a pre-social state of nature, but were the products of living in political society.  On the classical republican view of liberty, citizens exercise freedom within the context of existing social relations, historical associations and traditional communities, not as autonomous individuals set apart from their social and political ties.  In this way, liberty for the classical republican is positively defined by the political society instead of negatively defined in terms of the pre-social individual’s natural rights.

While prefigured by the European Enlightenment, the American Enlightenment also promoted the idea that a nation should be governed as a republic, whereby the state’s head is popularly elected, not appointed through a hereditary blood-line.  As North American colonists became increasingly convinced that British rule was corrupt and inimical to republican values, they joined militias and eventually formed the American Continental Army under George Washington’s command.   The Jeffersonian ideal of the yeoman farmer, which had its roots in the similar Roman ideal, represented the eighteenth-century American as both a hard-working agrarian and as a citizen-soldier devoted to the republic.  When elected to the highest office of the land, George Washington famously demurred when offered a royal title, preferring instead the more republican title of President.  Though scholarly debate persists over the relative importance of liberalism and republicanism during the American Revolution and Founding (see Recent Work section), the view that republican ideas were a formative influence on American Enlightenment thinking has gained widespread acceptance.

d. Conservatism

Though the Enlightenment is more often associated with liberalism and republicanism, an undeniable strain of conservatism emerged in the last stage of the Enlightenment, mainly as a reaction to the excesses of the French Revolution.  In 1790 Edmund Burkeanticipated the dissipation of order and decency in French society following the revolution (often referred to as “the Terror”) in his Reflections on the Revolution in France.  Though it is argued that Burkean conservatism was a reaction to the Enlightenment (or anti-Enlightenment), conservatives were also operating within the framework of Enlightenment ideas.  Some Enlightenment claims about human nature are turned back upon themselves and shown to break down when applied more generally to human culture.  For instance, Enlightenment faith in universal declarations of human rights do more harm than good when they contravene the conventions and traditions of specific nations, regions and localities. Similar to the classical republicans, Burke believed that human personality was the product of living in a political society, not a set of natural rights that predetermined our social and political relations. Conservatives attacked the notion of a social contract (prominent in the work of Hobbes, Locke and Rousseau) as a mythical construction that overlooked the plurality of groups and perspectives in society, a fact which made brokering compromises inevitable and universal consent impossible.  Burke only insisted on a tempered version, not a wholesale rejection of Enlightenment values.

Conservatism featured strongly in American Enlightenment thinking.  While Burke was critical of the French Revolution, he supported the American Revolution for disposing of English colonial misrule while creatively readapting British traditions and institutions to the American temperament.  American Enlightenment thinkers such as James Madison and John Adams held views that echoed and in some cases anticipated Burkean conservatism, leading them to criticize the rise of revolutionary France and the popular pro-French Jacobin clubs during and after the French Revolution.  In the forty-ninth Federalist Paper, James Madison deployed a conservative argument against frequent appeals to democratic publics on constitutional questions because they threatened to undermine political stability and substitute popular passion for the “enlightened reason” of elected representatives. Madison’s conservative view was opposed to Jefferson’s liberal view that a constitutional convention should be convened every twenty years, for “[t]he earth belongs to the living generation,” and so each new generation should be empowered to reconsider its constitutional norms.

e. Toleration

Toleration or tolerant pluralism was also a major theme in American Enlightenment thought.  Tolerance of difference developed in parallel with the early liberalism prevalent among Northern Europe’s merchant class.  It reflected their belief that hatred or fear of other races and creeds interfered with economic trade, extinguished freedom of thought and expression, eroded the basis for friendship among nations and led to persecution and war. Tiring of religious wars (particularly as the 16th century French wars of religion and the 17th century Thirty Years War), European Enlightenment thinkers imagined an age in which enlightened reason not religious dogmatism governed relations between diverse peoples with loyalties to different faiths. The Protestant Reformation and the Treaty of Westphalia significantly weakened the Catholic Papacy, empowered secular political institutions and provided the conditions for independent nation-states to flourish.

American thinkers inherited this principle of tolerant pluralism from their European Enlightenment forebearers.  Inspired by the Scottish Enlightenment thinkers John Knox and George Buchanan, American Calvinists created open, friendly and tolerant institutions such as the secular public school and democratically organized religion (which became the Presbyterian Church).   Many American Enlightenment thinkers, including Benjamin Franklin, Thomas Jefferson and James Madison, read and agreed with John Locke’s A Letter Concerning Toleration.  In it, Locke argued that government is ill-equipped to judge the rightness or wrongness of opposing religious doctrines, faith could not be coerced and if attempted the result would be greater religious and political discord.   So, civil government ought to protect liberty of conscience, the right to worship as one chooses (or not to worship at all) and refrain from establishing an official state-sanctioned church.  For America’s founders, the fledgling nation was to be a land where persons of every faith or no faith could settle and thrive peacefully and cooperatively without fear of persecution by government or fellow citizens.  Ben Franklin’s belief that religion was an aid to cultivating virtue led him to donate funds to every church in Philadelphia.  Defending freedom of conscience, James Madison would write that “[c]onscience is the most sacred of all property.”  In 1777, Thomas Jefferson drafted a religious liberty bill for Virginia to disestablish the government-sponsored Anglican Church—often referred to as “the precursor to the Religion Clauses of the First Amendment”—which eventually passed with James Madison’s help.

f. Scientific Progress

The Enlightenment enthusiasm for scientific discovery was directly related to the growth of deism and skepticism about received religious doctrine.  Deists engaged in scientific inquiry not only to satisfy their intellectual curiosity, but to respond to a divine calling to expose God’s natural laws.  Advances in scientific knowledge—whether the rejection of the geocentric model of the universe because of Copernicus, Kepler and Galileo’s work or the discovery of natural laws such as Newton’s mathematical explanation of gravity—removed the need for a constantly intervening God.  With the release of Sir Isaac Newton’s Principia in 1660, faith in scientific progress took institutional form in the Royal Society of England, the Académie des Sciences in France and later the Academy of Sciences in Germany.  In pre-revolutionary America, scientists or natural philosophers belonged to the Royal Society until 1768, when Benjamin Franklin helped create and then served as the first president of the American Philosophical Society.  Franklin became one of the most famous American scientists during the Enlightenment period because of his many practical inventions and his theoretical work on the properties of electricity.

3. Four American Enlightenment Thinkers

What follows are brief accounts of how four significant thinkers contributed to the eighteenth-century American Enlightenment: Benjamin Franklin, Thomas Jefferson, James Madison and John Adams.

a. Franklin

Benjamin Franklin, the author, printer, scientist and statesman who led America through a tumultuous period of colonial politics, a revolutionary war and its momentous, though no less precarious, founding as a nation.  In his Autobiography, he extolled the virtues of thrift, industry and money-making (or acquisitiveness).  For Franklin, the self-interested pursuit of material wealth is only virtuous when it coincides with the promotion of the public good through philanthropy and voluntarism—what is often called “enlightened self-interest.”  He believed that reason, free trade and a cosmopolitan spirit serve as faithful guides for nation-states to cultivate peaceful relations. Within nation-states, Franklin thought that “independent entrepreneurs make good citizens” because they pursue “attainable goals” and are “capable of living a useful and dignified life.” In his autobiography, Franklin claims that the way to “moral perfection” is to cultivate thirteen virtues (temperance, silence, order, resolution, frugality, industry, sincerity, justice, moderation, cleanliness, tranquility, chastity, and humility) as well as a healthy dose of “cheerful prudence.”  Franklin favored voluntary associations over governmental institutions as mechanisms to channel citizens’ extreme individualism and isolated pursuit of private ends into productive social outlets.  Not only did Franklin advise his fellow citizens to create and join these associations, but he also founded and participated in many himself.  Franklin was a staunch defender of federalism, a critic of narrow parochialism, a visionary leader in world politics and a strong advocate of religious liberty.

b. Jefferson

A Virginian statesman, scientist and diplomat, Jefferson is probably best known for drafting the Declaration of Independence.  Agreeing with Benjamin Franklin, he substituted “pursuit of happiness” for “property” in Locke’s schedule of natural rights, so that liberty to pursue the widest possible human ends would be accommodated.  Jefferson also exercised immense influence over the creation of the United States’ Constitution through his extended correspondence with James Madison during the 1787 Constitutional Convention (since Jefferson was absent, serving as a diplomat in Paris).  Just as Jefferson saw the Declaration as a test of the colonists’ will to revolt and separate from Britain, he also saw the Convention in Philadelphia, almost eleven years later, as a grand experiment in creating a new constitutional order.  Panel four of the Jefferson Memorial records how Thomas Jefferson viewed constitutions: “I am not an advocate for frequent changes in laws and constitutions, but laws and institutions must go hand in hand with the progress of the human mind. As that becomes more developed, more enlightened, as new discoveries are made, new truths discovered and manners and opinions change, with the change of circumstances, institutions must advance also to keep pace with the times.”  Jefferson’s words capture the spirit of organic constitutionalism, the idea that constitutions are living documents that transform over time in pace with popular thought, imagination and opinion.

c. Madison

Heralded as the “Father of the Constitution,” James Madison was, besides one of the most influential architects of the U.S. Constitution, a man of letters, a politician, a scientist and a diplomat who left an enduring legacy on American philosophical thought.  As a tireless advocate for the ratification of the Constitution, Madison advanced his most groundbreaking ideas in his jointly authoring The Federalist Papers with John Jay and Alexander Hamilton.  Indeed, two of his most enduring ideas—the large republic thesis and the argument for separation-of-powers and checks-and-balances—are contained there.  In the tenth Federalist paper, Madison explains the problem of factions, namely, that the development of groups with shared interests (advocates or interest groups) is inevitable and dangerous to republican government.  If we try to vanquish factions, then we will in turn destroy the liberty upon which their existence and activities are founded. Baron d’ Montesquieu, the seventeenth-century French philosopher, believed that the only way to have a functioning republic, one that was sufficiently democratic, was for it to be small, both in population and land mass (on the order of Ancient Athens or Sparta).  He then argues that a large and diverse republic will stop the formation of a majority faction; if small groups cannot communicate over long distances and coordinate effectively, the threat will be negated and liberty will be preserved (“you make it less probable that a majority of the whole will have a common motive to invade the rights of other citizens”).  When factions formed inside the government, a clever institutional design of checks and balances (first John Adams’s idea, where each branch would have a hand in the others’ domain) would avert excessive harm, so that “ambition must be made to counteract ambition” and, consequently, government will effectively “control itself.”

d. Adams

John Adams was also a founder, statesman, diplomat and eventual President who contributed to American Enlightenment thought.  Among his political writings, three stand out: Dissertation on the Canon and Feudal Law (1776), A Defense of the Constitutions of Government of the United States of America, Against the Attack of M. Turgot (1787-8), and Discourses on Davila (1791).  In the Dissertation, Adams faults Great Britain for deciding to introduce canon and feudal law, “the two greatest systems of tyranny,” to the North American colonies. Once introduced, elections ceased in the North American colonies, British subjects felt enslaved and revolution became inevitable.   In the Defense, Adams offers an uncompromising defense of republicanism.  He disputes Turgot’s apology for unified and centralized government, arguing that insurance against consolidated state power and support for individual liberty require separating government powers between branches and installing careful checks and balances.  Nevertheless, a strong executive branch is needed to defend the people against “aristocrats” who will attempt to deprive liberty from the mass of people.  Revealing the Enlightenment theme of conservatism, Adams criticized the notion of unrestricted popular rule or pure democracy in the Discourses.  Since humans are always desirous of increasing their personal power and reputation, all the while making invidious comparisons, government must be designed to constrain the effects of these passionate tendencies.  Adams writes: “Consider that government is intended to set bounds to passions which nature has not limited; and to assist reason, conscience, justice, and truth in controlling interests which, without it, would be as unjust as uncontrollable.”

4. Contemporary Work

Invocations of universal freedom draw their inspiration from Enlightenment thinkers such as John Locke, Immanuel Kant, and Thomas Jefferson, but come into conflict with contemporary liberal appeals to multiculturalism and pluralism.  Each of these Enlightenment thinkers sought to ground the legitimacy of the state on a theory of rational-moral political order reflecting universal truths about human nature—for instance, that humans are carriers of inalienable rights (Locke), autonomous agents (Kant), or fundamentally equal creations (Jefferson).  However, many contemporary liberals—for instance, Graeme Garrard, John Gray and Richard Rorty—fault Enlightenment liberalism for its failure to acknowledge and accommodate the differences among citizens’ incompatible and equally reasonable religious, moral and philosophical doctrines, especially in multicultural societies.  According to these critics, Enlightenment liberalism, rather than offering a neutral framework, discloses a full-blooded doctrine that competes with alternative views of truth, the good life, and human nature.  This pluralist critique of Enlightenment liberalism’s universalism makes it difficult to harmonize the American Founders’ appeal to universal human rights with their insistence on religious tolerance.  However, as previously noted, evidence of Burkean conservatism offers an alternative to the strong universalism that these recent commentators criticize in American Enlightenment thought.

What in recent times has been characterized as the ‘Enlightenment project’ is the general idea that human rationality can and should be made to serve ethical and humanistic ends.  If human societies are to achieve genuine moral progress, parochialism, dogma and prejudice ought to give way to science and reason in efforts to solve pressing problems. The American Enlightenment project signifies how America has taken a leading role in promoting Enlightenment ideals during that period of human history commonly referred to as ‘modernity.’  Still, there is no consensus about the exact legacy of American Enlightenment thinkers—for instance, whether republican or liberal ideas are predominant.  Until the publication of J. G. A. Pocock’s The Machiavellian Moment (1975), most scholars agreed that liberal (especially Lockean) ideas were more dominant than republican ones.  Pockock’s work initiated a sea change towards what is now the widely accepted view that liberal and republican ideas had relatively equal sway during the eighteenth-century Enlightenment, both in America and Europe.  Gordon Wood and Bernard Bailyn contend that republicanism was dominant and liberalism recessive in American Enlightenment thought.  Isaac Kramnick still defends the orthodox position that American Enlightenment thinking was exclusively Lockean and liberal, thus explaining the strongly individualistic character of modern American culture.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Bailyn, Bernard. The Ideological Origins of the American Revolution. Harvard: Harvard University Press, 1967.
  • Ferguson, Robert A. The American Enlightenment. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1997.
  • Hampson, Norman. The Enlightenment: An Evaluation of its Assumptions. London: Penguin, 1968.
  • Himmelfarb, Gertrude. The Roads to Modernity: The British, French and American Enlightenments. London: Vintage, 2008.
  • Israel, Jonathan. A Resolution of the Mind—Radical Enlightenment and the Intellectual Origins of Modern Democracy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2009.
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Author Information

Shane J. Ralston
Pennsylvania State University
U. S. A.