Marsilio Ficino (1433—1499)

FicinoMarsilio Ficino was a Florentine philosopher, translator, and commentator, largely responsible for the revival of Plato and Platonism in the Renaissance. He has been widely recognized by historians of philosophy for his defense of the immortality of the soul, as well as for his translations of Plato, Plotinus, and the Hermetic corpus from Greek to Latin. Ficino is considered the most important advocate of Platonism in the Renaissance, and his philosophical writings and translations are thought to have made a significant contribution to the development of early modern philosophies.

The Platonic Theology is Ficino’s most original and systematic philosophical treatise. It is a lengthy and encyclopedic defense of the immortality of the soul against what he considered the growing threats of Epicureanism and Averroism. While arguing for immortality, Ficino articulates those positions that are most characteristic of his philosophy. He first provides his own restructuring of the Neoplatonic hierarchy of being. This metaphysical structure is used to ensure the dignity and immortality of the soul by situating it at a privileged midpoint between God and prime matter. However, this hierarchy also has negative consequences for the qualitative character of human existence on account of the soul’s proximity to matter. Finally, the Platonic Theology lays down the basic principles of Ficino’s animistic natural philosophy, according to which a World Soul is imminent in the material world, imparting motion, life, and order.

In addition to the Platonic Theology, Ficino also composed extensive commentaries on Plato and Plotinus, wrote a practical medical treatise, and carried on a voluminous correspondence with contemporaries across Europe. There are noteworthy elements in his writings that are less traditional and orthodox by some contemporary philosophical standards. For example, he was deeply influenced by the Hermetic tradition, and describes a species of knowledge, or natural magic, that draws down the intellectual and moral virtues of the heavens to the terrestrial world. Ficino also endorses an ancient theological tradition that included, to name a few, Hermes Trismegistus, Pythagoras, and Orpheus among its ranks. He held that this pagan tradition espoused a pious philosophy that in fact presaged and confirmed Christianity.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. The Platonic Academy of Florence
  3. The Ancient Theology and Pious Philosophy
  4. Platonic Theology
    1. Metaphysics
    2. Epistemology
    3. The Dignity of Humanity and the Human Condition
    4. The Immortality of the Soul
  5. Ethics and Love
  6. Legacy
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Marsilio Ficino was born in Figline, not far from Florence, in 1433. He was the son of a physician, and Cosimo de’Medici—one of the richest and most powerful patrons of the fifteenth century—was among his father’s patients. While the precise details of his early life and education remain largely unclear to us today, it can safely be said that he studied Scholastic philosophy and medicine at the University of Florence, and that he was exposed to the burgeoning educational movement of Italian Humanism. Ficino’s earliest philosophical writings are largely Scholastic in their consideration of metaphysical, logical, and natural philosophical questions. In particular, Thomas Aquinas had a strong influence on significant aspects of his early thought, and this influence is thought to have persisted in his later philosophical writings.

The biographical contours of Ficino’s early life become clearer in the 1450s. He lectured on Plato’s Philebus; he also taught for a short time at the university in Florence, and privately as a tutor. As a young man Ficino fell under the influence of the Roman poet Lucretius. A manuscript copy of his didactic Epicurean poem, On the Nature of Things, was rediscovered in a monastery in 1417. After its recovery the poem was copied, disseminated, and eventually found its way into print and vernacular languages. Ficino was among the first generation of philosophers with direct access to the actual text of On the Nature of Things, which is thought to have played an important role in the development of early modern philosophy and science. During the late 1450s, Ficino composed a short commentary on Lucretius, the first since antiquity, as well as a treatise on pleasure. In this treatise he praises the Epicurean definition of pleasure as the removal of pain from the body and disturbance from the soul, and argues that Epicureanism is superior to the vulgar hedonism of someone like Aristippus. Ficino suggests that he experienced an intellectual or spiritual crisis during this time, and as a result ultimately rejected Epicurus and Lucretius as incompatible with deeply held philosophical and religious commitments. In a letter, Ficino reports that he burned his youthful commentary on Lucretius. Despite this Epicurus and Lucretius left an enduring stamp on Ficino’s thought that is visible in the mature philosophical writings, and historians of Renaissance philosophy are still assessing this influence today.

During the 1450s Ficino began to study Greek. In time, his knowledge of classical Greek culminated in one of his most lasting philosophical and scholarly achievements and contributions—his translation of Plato’s complete works into Latin. In 1462, Cosimo de’Medici commissioned Ficino to translate a manuscript copy of Plato’s extant writings. Around the same time, Cosimo also gave him the proceeds from a small property, as well as a villa in Careggi, not far from Florence. The conditions of the 1460s provided Ficino with the perfect opportunity to fully dedicate himself to translating Plato’s complete writings into Latin. His edition marked the first time that Plato’s extant corpus was translated into a Western language. Ficino’s work on Plato, however, was quickly interrupted when Cosimo requested that he also translate the Corpus Hermeticum into Latin. At the time, the Hermetic corpus was believed by many to be an ancient collection of theological writings that contained sacred wisdom. It was, however, written in the early years of Christianity. In 1464, Ficino read his translations of Plato’s dialogues to Cosimo as the aging patron lay dying.

In the late 1460s, after completing his translation of Plato, Ficino started working on his Platonic Theology: On the Immortality of the Soul. This book was finished in 1474, but it did not find its way into print until 1482. The Platonic Theology is Ficino’s longest and most systematic philosophical work. In 1473, he was ordained a priest, and after completing his Platonic Theology, dedicated himself primarily to translation, commentary, and correspondence. During this time Ficino also wrote the bulk of his commentaries on Plato’s dialogues. The last two decades of Ficino’s life were especially productive. In the 1480s, he translated the Enneads of the second-century Neoplatonist Plotinus, and also wrote commentaries on them. An edition of Plotinus was published in 1492. During this time Ficino completed his Three Books on Life, a medical and astrological treatise. After its 1489 publication it became one of his most popular and influential books. The third book presents Ficino’s theory of natural magic, which has since become the definitive Renaissance consideration of the subject.

Throughout his life Ficino carried on a steady correspondence with philosophers, poets, and politicians across Europe. This choice of philosophical expression shows the influence that Humanism had on him. In many letters, Ficino clarifies his understanding of certain Platonic concepts, such as poetic furor; but on a whole his correspondence is not strictly philosophical in nature, at least not by academic standards today. Even so, it contains information that is central to an accurate appreciation of his thought. Ficino conceived of philosophy as a way of life that purified and prepared those who practice it correctly for a life well lived. Ficino’s correspondence contains a good deal of practical advice, and he is often found giving counsel on how to cope with the deaths of children, spouses, and friends, or on how to extend one’s life; he also lends sundry medical advice, and even discusses the astrological placement of planets that contribute to one’s character traits. The letters serve both to clarify the content of his philosophy, as well as to shed a different light on what he perceived his role to be as a philosopher and an advocate of Platonism. These sources teach us that Ficino did not define philosophy narrowly. Instead, he saw himself as a doctor of sorts that was concerned with questions that concerned the health of bodies, minds, and souls. This practical concern is clearly displayed in his correspondence, and his Three Books on Life. Ficino edited and published his correspondence in 1494. He died in 1499.

2. The Platonic Academy of Florence

In the fourteenth century, the poet and Humanist Francesco Petrarch praised Plato as the prince of philosophers. In so doing, Petrarch turned to Plato as an antidote to Scholastic Aristotelianism, which at the time dominated the medieval university curriculum. During the Middle Ages the bulk of Plato’s dialogues—except for the Phaedo, Meno, and parts of the Parmenides and Timaeus—were inaccessible to Western philosophers because they were not available in Latin. Consequently, knowledge of Plato’s philosophy at this time was largely indirect and incomplete. Following Petrarch’s lead, early fifteenth-century Humanists (such as Leonardo Bruni) saw the importance of studying classical Greek, and they translated, among other things, a handful of Plato’s dialogues into Latin.

Ficino’s translation represents the fulfillment of these early Humanist aspirations for a Latin edition of Plato. It is difficult to overstate the significance of this achievement, or the impact that it had on the development of early modern philosophies. His Latin translation of Plato enriched the sources available to philosophers in the West, and thereby changed the form and content of philosophy. Ficino largely finished his translation of Plato’s complete works in the 1460s, but they did not appear in print until 1484. The first edition included Ficino’s short descriptions or summaries of what he considered the key arguments of the dialogues; a 1494 edition was expanded to include his lengthy commentaries on Plato’s Symposium, Philebus, Phaedrus, Timaeus, Parmenides, Sophist, and Republic Book VIII. Eventually Ficino’s commentary on the Symposium—an unorthodox dialogue itself loosely inspired by the original—became one of his most popular and influential treatments of Plato. In it he identified Plato’s theory of love with Christian love, and argued that the proper love of another person is in fact preparation for the love of God. He invented the phrase Platonic love, and his interpretation was especially influential in the sixteenth century. His Timaeus commentary is significant because it represents the first consideration of the dialogue in its entirety since antiquity; medieval philosophers only had access to roughly half of the dialogue, and Calcidius’ commentary was necessarily truncated. Ficino’s translations of Plato’s complete works went through many printings and were used by philosophers and scholars for centuries. They continue to be recognized for their precision and fidelity to the original Greek.

Through his translations and commentaries, as well as his Platonic Theology, Ficino played a central role in the Renaissance revival of Platonism. In the second half of the fifteenth century, he stood at the center of a group of intellectuals that were drawn specifically to Plato and Platonism, and more generally to classical antiquity. As a result of his advocacy, historians of Renaissance philosophy for a long time thought that Ficino founded and headed a formal Platonic Academy in Florence that was inspired by Plato’s school in ancient Athens. However, the precise nature of Florence’s Academy remains unclear today, and some are skeptical that any such academy ever really existed. It seems unlikely that Ficino headed a formal educational institution in any real sense. More plausible is the hypothesis that Ficino’s occasional reference to the revival of Plato’s academy in Florence actually designated the presence of a manuscript copy of Plato’s dialogues in Florence, to Plato’s teachings and philosophy, and his own efforts to revive Plato in Florence through his translations and commentaries. Whether or not Ficino actually headed a Platonic Academy in Florence, he was nonetheless instrumental as an advocate of Platonism during the Renaissance.

3. The Ancient Theology and Pious Philosophy

Ficino’s philosophy is indebted to a wide variety of philosophical sources and traditions. Although his thought is eclectic, he does not generally seek to bring distinct and apparently incompatible views into accord or harmony with one another. His work is generally a blend of traditional philosophies, both ancient and medieval, and ideas that are drawn from the less-orthodox Neoplatonic and Hermetic traditions. The influences of Platonism, Neoplatonism, and Scholasticism are particularly prominent.

Like many of his contemporaries, Ficino believed that Hermes Trismegistus was an ancient Egyptian theologian and philosopher of sacred and divine wisdom. In the preface to his translation of the Corpus Hermeticum, Ficino explains that Hermes “foresaw the ruin of the old religion, the rise of the new faith, [and] the coming of Christ.”  In fact, Ficino believed in a single ancient theological tradition (prisca theologia) that stretched back to Hermes in ancient Egypt and included Pythagoras, Orpheus, Philolaus, and Plato, to name a few, among its ranks. This ancient tradition, he argues, espoused a pious philosophy (pia philosophia) in which religious and philosophical truths coincide. The advent of Christianity brought about the fullest and clearest expression of this pious philosophy, though vestiges of it can be found much earlier. Over the course of the history of philosophy, according to Ficino, the fortune of the pious philosophy has waxed and waned, and there are periods during which it is hardly present at all. He considered Plato an especially effective advocate of the pious philosophy; in the preface to the Platonic Theology, he explains that no matter what subject Plato discusses “he quickly brings it round, and in a spirit of utmost piety, to the contemplation and worship of God.”

4. Platonic Theology

The Platonic Theology is Marsilio Ficino’s philosophical magnum opus. Its overall aim is to defend the immortality of the soul, and to this end Ficino avails himself of a wide variety of arguments. For Ficino, this question is at the heart of human self-interest and well-being. In the first chapter, he argues that if human beings were merely mortal, then there would be “no animal more miserable than man.”  Ficino’s core argument is that the natural human desire for immortality must be vindicated by an afterlife. Were it not, this desire would be empty, vain, and this would call into question both the perfection of nature and God’s wisdom and goodness.

While arguing for the soul’s immortality Ficino elaborates on many of those positions and arguments that are distinctive of his philosophy. He presents and defends the basic principles of his metaphysics. While he is deeply indebted to earlier metaphysical traditions, especially the Neoplatonic and Scholastic traditions, elements of these traditions are generally adapted to his own philosophical aims and purposes. Ficino also presents his case for the inherent dignity of humanity. This defense depends in large part on his own restructuring of the Neoplatonic hierarchy of being, according to which the soul is located centrally between God and matter. The soul’s metaphysical position also ensures its immortality. Ficino argues that the soul’s troubled psychological condition is an unfortunate side effect of this hierarchy. He detects a disconnect between the soul’s divinity and the sundry demands and problems that the body causes for it. While the soul is immortal and occupied a privileged place on the great chain of being, its psychological condition is one of exile, longing, and confusion regarding its own nature. Finally, Ficino argues for his vitalistic natural philosophy according to which matter requires the presence of something incorporeal—namely soul—for it to be substantial and real.

The Platonic Theology is a rich and challenging book. Its structure and content may produce confusion and frustration in some contemporary readers. There is an overarching logical structure to the book, but Ficino chooses not to clearly state many of his central assumptions and themes, and the route he takes to his conclusions can often appear circuitous. Ficino frequently utilizes metaphysical and epistemological assumptions, but he does not in every case define or defend them. This is not to say, however, that his views are merely asserted or that his reasoning is flawed in some significant way. Many of his assumptions are generally embedded in earlier philosophical traditions, and thus his views and arguments have to be placed in the proper historical context in order to be appreciated for their rigor and coherence. Ficino thought that philosophy done properly required an ongoing conversation with ancient philosophies. A familiarity with earlier philosophies is therefore necessary in order to fully appreciate and assess the arguments of the Platonic Theology.

a. Metaphysics

Ficino’s metaphysics is a blend of elements drawn from Platonism, Neoplatonism, and medieval Scholasticism. Broadly speaking, he maintains a Platonic division between the intelligible and sensible realms or between being and becoming. Throughout the Platonic Theology, he is found employing the hylomorphic terminology of the Scholastics in his detailed analysis of the nature of things. Ficino embraces and uses the metaphysical hierarchy developed by the Neoplatonist Plotinus, according to which the progressive levels of being emanate from a single source.

In the preface, Ficino explains that a central aim of the Platonic Theology is to demonstrate to materialist philosophers that matter is less real than those incorporeal entities (such as souls and forms) that transcend the senses. To accomplish this aim Ficino relies primarily on Plato’s dialogues, because in his estimation they most successfully demote the reality of the material world, while at the same time grounding and elevating the metaphysical priority of souls and forms. Furthermore, he believes that Platonism provides the most solid philosophical foundation for Christianity. Throughout the Platonic Theology, Ficino embraces the metaphysical distinction, prominent in Plato’s dialogues, between being and becoming or between the intelligible and sensible realms. He argues that the former is more real than the latter, and is therefore more worthy of our enduring attention, devotion, and study. Along these lines he maintains that forms are the perfect archetypes of all material things and exist unchangeably in the divine mind. They are in fact the genuine cause of the sensible qualities and properties of the material world. By contrast, the world of matter is shadowy and deceptive. It engenders confusion and imprisons the minds of many people.

Ficino’s metaphysics is overwhelmingly Platonic. But his theory of material substances is indebted to Scholasticism for many of its most salient features. While Ficino’s philosophy is clearly otherworldly—in the sense that he maintains the existence and metaphysical priority of realities apart from the material world—this does not prevent him from speculating about the metaphysics of matter and body in the early books of the Platonic Theology. In fact, he believes that doing so is in keeping with the broader aims of the book. By and large, Ficino analyzes material substances along traditional hylomorphic lines, according to which they are constituted by three principles: matter, form, and privation. Matter functions as the passive substrate of the forms that are active in making something what it is, and privation is what a substance can potentially become. The matter of a thing is relative to the level of organization under consideration; the matter of a statue is marble, but the marble itself is not without its own form and matter. When all qualities, both substantial and accidental, are stripped from a substance there is at bottom a single formless prime matter that is one and the same for all things. He holds that prime matter exists in a chaotic and confused state of potency. For Ficino, it is something that is ontologically basic and epistemically impenetrable. It is therefore difficult, if not impossible, to say anything directly about it other than that it must exist as the substratum of form. Here Ficino is echoing Plotinus who compared understanding matter to the eye seeing darkness.

Even though Ficino employs the basic terms of the Scholastics, he makes significant modifications to this framework. These changes are consistent with his broader philosophical commitments and the overall objectives of the Platonic Theology. First, it is noteworthy that he embraces a theory of seminal reasons, according to which seeds are spread throughout matter, and are the cause of things coming to be at appointed times. Unlike the Scholastics, Ficino judges that the qualities or properties of material things are protean, not self-sufficient, unstable, and parasitic on incorporeal forms for any reality and causal efficacy in the world of matter. Here his underlying Platonism becomes apparent. Ficino says that material forms are corrupted and contaminated when they are embedded in the “bosom” of matter. He poetically describes material qualities as “mere shadows that come and go like the reflections of lofty trees in a rushing stream”  (I.III.15). Ficino sees the basic elements of the world as existing in a constant and chaotic state of change, and he holds that whatever stability they exhibit is on account of their cause, that is, their incorporeal archetypes. According to Ficino, this is not merely true of the elements, but of all qualities of material things across the board, both those that are substantial and those that are accidental. In this way, Ficino traces back all of the qualities of this world to something eternal and incorporeal as their cause, and this is the basic unit of reality for him. He accepts a metaphysical principle that there is a first in each genus (primum) that is the fullest and most perfect expression of any particular species quality. It does not include anything that does not properly belong to that genus. The first in each genus is ultimately the cause of every particular expression of that quality. Ficino, therefore, demotes the reality of material forms or qualities while at the same time buttressing the reality of incorporeal forms. Although he analyzes material substances along hylomorphic lines, he at the same time alters this framework in an effort to ground his Platonic metaphysics, and ultimately the immortality of the soul.

There are prominent Neoplatonic elements at the core of Ficino’s metaphysics. He inherited from Plotinus a particular approach to metaphysics that is a hierarchical superstructure, with distinct levels or hypostases, all of which draw their being from an overflowing singular source. The source of all being is the One for Plotinus and God for Ficino. He considers all being to be a progressive emanation from the divine, and although each hypostasis is distinct, what is above serves as a dynamic bridge to what is below. Everything in Ficino’s cosmos has its own unique place and degree of perfection, beginning with God at the summit and descending through the celestial spheres, angels, and souls, all the way down to the elements of the terrestrial sphere. In it there is nothing that is vain or superfluous, and Ficino thinks that everything is drawn to its good or end by a natural appetite.

Ficino generally recognizes five distinct levels of reality. But he at times changes the precise arrangement and structure of the hypostases of this hierarchy. At the top of the hierarchy is God, which is the source of all being and perfection. The first hypostasis that God produces is angelic mind. It contains the archetypes and forms of all things in a timeless and immutable state. These forms are the essences of all possible entities, and they are responsible for the qualities and properties of material things. Next in this progression comes the rational soul, which imparts motion and vitality to the cosmos. Ficino posits a World Soul (anima mundi) that is immanent in all of nature, and individual souls that animate sundry entities in the world, including the celestial spheres, living creatures, and even the elements. Mind is eternal and unmoving; soul is likewise eternal, but differs because it is in a perpetual state of motion. Soul stands at the metaphysical node or bond between what is above and below; while it is drawn to forms and the divine above, it is responsible for the governance of what comes below. Beneath rational soul is the hypostasis of quality, which is representative of the material forms found in nature. The patterns of qualities are grounded in the second hypostasis, mind; the source of its motion and alteration comes from soul. Finally, the hierarchy of being is extinguished with the lowest level of reality—body or corporeal matter. Ficino defines body as matter that is extended in length, breadth, and depth. It functions as the bearer of qualities, but contributes nothing of its own to the nature of things.

Even though Ficino generally marks a distinction between being and becoming, or between the incorporeal and corporeal, he is no simple dualist. His view of soul, and the role that it plays in the material world, is fundamentally different from, for example, the strict dualism of the seventeenth-century philosopher René Descartes. Matter and soul are entirely distinct from one another, according to Descartes, and these two basic substances share no qualities in common. In his treatise on physics, The World, Descartes distinguishes himself from earlier approaches to natural philosophy when he explains that he uses the word “nature” to “signify matter itself,” and not “some goddess or any other sort of imaginary power” (AT XI 37). According to Descartes, a natural philosopher does not need to appeal to anything other than matter in order to properly explain the natural world. On the contrary, according to Ficino, the material world is not something that can be adequately explained by turning to matter and motion alone; nature is an active power that suffuses matter and provides it with its life, activity, and order. On this account, nature is a dynamic force operating on material things from within, and this is the proper or genuine cause of things changing, as well as their generation and corruption. Soul, therefore, has a paramount role to play in Ficino’s natural philosophy.

Like Plato and his Neoplatonic interpreters, Ficino makes competing claims about the relative goodness of the material world. In his Timaeus, Plato argues that the sensible world is on a whole good and beautiful because it is modeled on eternal forms. In other dialogues, such as the Phaedo and Republic, the sensible world is a shadowy and deceptive prison. Plotinus recognizes this tension in Plato and comments on it in his Enneads. Ficino inherits this ambiguity about the goodness of the world, even if negative appraisals are more frequent and prominent in the Platonic Theology than positive ones. Like Plato, Ficino asserts that the creator is a benevolent and wise architect, and that these qualities are reflected in God’s creation; however, he also maintains that the world of matter is shadowy, evil, and to some degree unreal. Furthermore, Ficino blames matter and body for the mind’s tendency to be confused and deceived about what is real and good. On a whole, therefore, Ficino’s overall assessment of the material world—at least as far as the human condition is concerned—is negative.

In his metaphysics, Ficino is not drawn to austere and desert-like frameworks, and he was not reductionistic in his thinking. As such, he belongs to a tradition of metaphysicians, including the seventeenth-century Platonist G. W. Leibniz, that embrace a rich and expansive ontology. Ficino lays out a tapestry of entities that comprise the world. In nature alone he countenances the existence of matter, qualities, and a cavalcade of souls, including a World Soul, that impart motion and vital powers to all aspects of the material world. Ficino claims that nature is in fact replete with souls; there are souls that belong to the elements, to non-human animals, as well as a soul that is responsible for the growth of rocks and trees from the earth’s surface.

b. Epistemology

In the Platonic Theology, Ficino does not address epistemological issues as directly or with the same degree of frequency as he does metaphysical ones. Nonetheless, the broad contours of a view can be sketched by paying close attention to the occasional discussion of the origin, nature, and value of knowledge. Throughout this work Ficino makes scattered remarks about the mind’s capabilities, what exactly it apprehends when it knows, and the effect that knowledge has on those who possess it. Generally these comments arise when Ficino is either discussing the nature and powers of the human mind and distinguishing them from the body, or when he speculates about the divine mind and draws a comparison with finite minds.

Ficino holds that knowledge is rooted in forms, not matter. However, the metaphysics of matter described above has certain implications for what exactly stands as the object of knowledge. He argues that the degradation of forms in matter requires that the mind grasps something other than sensible forms when it knows. If it did not, he argues, then knowledge would not be stable and fixed; instead, it would vary and change as the qualities of material things do. Rather, when the mind knows it apprehends intelligible forms, and not the sensible forms that include the individual traits that are distinctive of particular objects. These forms are stable and unchanging, and as such Ficino claims that they produce stable and unchanging knowledge.

Knowledge does not, according to Ficino, come about in stages, or as a result of a gradual process. The mind does not take gradual steps and build upon its experiences to arrive at universals. On the contrary, he describes knowledge as coming about in an instantaneous flash, and not in a progressive or abstractive manner. Ficino claims that philosophical reflection on the nature of things prepares and purifies the mind of falsehood until it is ready to receive the clarity of truth. This arrival is simple and immediate. Ficino explains that “speculative virtue does not proceed stage by stage from one part of itself to another, but blazes forth wholly and suddenly” (VIII.III.6). Ficino even holds that intelligible forms are distinct from, and discontinuous with, sensible forms, even if our experience of particular material things can be the root cause of the mind’s coming to know something. Furthermore, he makes some interesting suggestions about the existence of primary truths that contain other truths within them, and he claims that the knowledge of one primary truth can elicit knowledge of others. While Ficino mentions that such primary truths exist, he does not elaborate as to what exactly these truths are or what one would look like.

There are several Platonic epistemic themes that are prominent in the Platonic Theology. Ficino maintains that the mind is nourished by truth, and he sees it as edifying of the overall condition of the human soul. He also claims that there is much to recommend the Platonic doctrine of reminiscence, even if he rejects the transmigration of souls as heretical. Also, his description of learning calls to mind Plato’s Theaetetus, where Socrates describes himself as a midwife of sorts. In this vein, Ficino holds that the mind already has within itself the intelligible forms that it will, if it is diligent, come to know, or remember. These forms exist latently in the mind, and learning is a process of drawing out from the mind what is, in a certain sense, already there.

c. The Dignity of Humanity and the Human Condition

The metaphysical hierarchy outlined in the above section on metaphysics has significant philosophical consequences for both the dignity of the rational soul, and the qualitative character of the human condition. Ficino argues that the soul’s location on the chain of being lends to it a privileged position on the hierarchy of being, and is therefore responsible for its dignity and uniqueness. In different contexts Ficino changes the precise structure of this pentadic hierarchy, but the soul’s centrality is a consistent theme. This is an alteration of Plotinus’ original hierarchy and ensures the soul’s dignity and immortality. The soul is situated at the precise center of the hierarchy standing midway between God above and matter below. Ficino explains the structure of his metaphysics in the following way:

We would do well to call soul the third and middle essence, as the Platonists do, because it is the mean for all and the third from both directions. If you descend from God, you will find soul at the third level down; or at the third level up, if you ascend from body.

In the same chapter he continues:

But the third essence set between them is such that it cleaves to the higher while not abandoning the lower; and in it, therefore the higher and the lower are linked together… So by a natural instinct it ascends to the higher and descends to the lower. In ascending it does not abandon the things below it; in descending, it does not relinquish the things above it. (III.II.1-2)

The soul is the “fitting knot” or “node” that binds the upper half of the hierarchy with the lower. On account of its place in the hierarchy, Ficino explains that the soul is at one and the same time drawn to what is above, as well as responsible for the governance of nature below. Further, Ficino thinks that it shares some properties in common with what is above and below, and as a result it is perfectly well-suited to serve as the bridge between the upper and the lower halves of the hierarchy. The soul is eternal and immortal because it shares in divinity above. It also suffuses all of nature and lends to its motion and vitality. Ficino sees the soul as charged with the governance of the material world, and is intimately responsible for its potential well-being. This is a unique and privileged metaphysical role for it. He argues that the soul is not connected to any distinct part of the body, but communicates its life-giving power throughout.

The soul’s centrality in the great chain of being ensures its dignity and immortality. However, it is also responsible for its wretchedness and depravity. The soul’s proximity to the body has a negative effect on its ability to truly appreciate its own nature and immortality. Individual souls are by and large overwhelmed with the governance of their bodies, and the material world assaults them with violent motions and sensations. As a result the soul may fail to recognize its own nature and divinity. The conditions of embodiment also frustrate its search for truth. Metaphysically speaking, it functions as the node between the upper and the lower, but in practice it is wedded so tightly with matter that it naturally, Ficino believes, comes to the conclusion that it is not distinct from it. This is the cause of the common sense materialism that most people uncritically accept, and that says something is not real unless it is a body. A pivotal consequence of this situation is that the soul forgets its own privileged nature and divinity, and in many cases concludes that it is nothing distinct from matter. Thus, there is a disconnect in Ficino’s philosophy between the metaphysical nature of the soul, and its subjective experience when joined with matter. This is the cause, according to Ficino, of the wretchedness of the human condition, which is characterized by a certain confusion regarding what is real and worthy of its pursuit.

d. The Immortality of the Soul

The primary aim of the Platonic Theology is of course to demonstrate the immortality of the soul. Ficino provides a plurality of arguments across the eighteen books of this work. He argues that the soul’s immortality is a consequence of its position on the metaphysical hierarchy. He also provides arguments that rest upon the metaphysical and epistemological foundations of the Platonic Theology. Still other arguments are polemical and aim at refuting relevant and uneliminated alternatives, such as the positions of Epicurus and Averroes. Epicurus and Averroes—with the former denying immortality, and the latter claiming that it was one and the same for all—were growing in popularity in some academic circles in fifteenth-century Italy.

First and foremost, Ficino argues that the natural appetite for immortality entails post-mortem existence for the soul. He starts with the assumption that our primary goal is to ascend to a spiritual union with God, and he holds that this is a basic and natural desire shared and acted on by most human beings. If these efforts were to go unfulfilled, Ficino concludes that they would be otiose, vain, and even perverse. Perhaps more importantly, this would stand in direct violation of the perfection of nature and the wisdom of God. Thus, Ficino concludes that the natural desire for immortality must be vindicated in an actual afterlife.

In addition, in the Platonic Theology Ficino puts forward two prominent argument types that draw upon the nature and powers of the human mind, and on his theory of matter and body. He aims to show that the rational powers of the soul all support immortality and that these essential functions are in no way dependent upon matter and body. He argues that there is a correspondence or likeness between incorporeal entities and the soul. The intellect knows best when it does not depend upon the body or the senses whatsoever, and instead experiences an immediate union with forms. Ficino says that “when the soul despises corporeals and when the senses have been allayed and the clouds of phantasmata dissipated … then the intellect discerns truly and is at its brightest” (IX.II.2). Ficino takes this as evidence that the soul did not originate with the body. Instead, he argues that the soul is ineluctably drawn to things divine, and its union with incorporeals comes most naturally to it. He says that the soul was born for the contemplation of things divine, and through them it is enriched and perfected. Both the soul’s correspondence to incorporeals and the pull that they have on it are indicative of its underlying nature—like things incorporeal, it is immortal.

Ficino also aims to show that there are dissimilarities between the soul and matter. He argues that the essential functions of the mind are distinct from the body, and further that body cannot in any way give rise to them. These arguments aim to refute materialists who think that matter can give rise to the soul’s essential functions. Ficino argues that the soul’s most important operations are inconsistent with the basic conditions of corporeality. In fact, the body, the senses, and the passions all conspire to impede and frustrate the soul in its search for knowledge and goodness. Much like Plato in the Phaedo, Ficino argues that the soul’s overall condition improves the farther it is removed from the material world, and the soul knows best when it does not draw upon the senses. These dissimilarities establish, Ficino thinks, the soul’s essential otherness from matter and body. Ficino’s metaphysics of matter is also tailored to provide support for immortality. He provides what he calls a “Platonic” definition of body, according to which it is composed of matter and extension. Both matter and extension are passive and inert, and cannot give rise in any way to the essential functions of the soul. Therefore, Ficino concludes that it is only on account of the presence of something incorporeal, namely forms and souls, that material things are at all substantial.

5. Ethics and Love

Ficino did not compose a systematic treatise on ethics. Nonetheless, his familiarity with classical Greek philosophy means that ethical considerations are central to many of his philosophical works, and he often comes around to discussing human virtues and well-being. Ficino does not generally place an emphasis on the rightness of actions, or on duties or obligations for that matter. Instead, he focuses on the health and development of the whole person, which is consistent with what is today called virtue ethics. Ficino marks the traditional distinction between intellectual and moral virtues. The speculative virtues concern, for instance, the understanding of things divine, the knowledge of nature, and the craftsman’s ability to produce artifacts. This species of virtue is acquired through learning and speculation, and it is characterized by an intellectual state of clarity. The moral virtues come about through custom and habit, and their domain is human desires and appetites. Ficino holds that the end of moral virtues is to purify the soul and to ultimately release it from the sometimes overwhelming demands made by the body. Thus, moral virtue produces a state of soul that governs desires and appetites so that they do not take control of the soul, thereby leading to an incontinent or intemperate character. In the end, both the speculative and moral virtues are consistent with Ficino’s broader aspirations as a Christian Platonist. For him the virtues are prerequisites that prepare the soul for its inner ascent up the hierarchy of being, ultimately uniting it with God.

Ficino’s theory of love plays a central role in his ethics. He defines love as the desire for beauty. Love originates with God, and it is the link or bond that all things share in common. Here Ficino follows the patterns left by Plato and Plotinus. Beautiful things ignite or inspire the soul with love. When an individual thing is loved properly, the soul ascends progressively from love of the particular to the universal. The lover, therefore, turns inwardly to the soul from the corporeal world, and thus ultimately finds its end in God. However, it is possible for the soul to love improperly and become fixated on beautiful objects. This results in a life of confusion and wretchedness. Thus, for Ficino, the proper application of love lies at the heart of human happiness.

6. Legacy

Ficino left an enduring impression on the history of Western philosophy. His philosophical writings, and his translations of Platonic and Hermetic texts, exercised both a direct and indirect influence on the form and content of philosophy in subsequent centuries. The Platonic Theology was instrumental in elevating the defense of the immortality of the soul to philosophical prominence in the early modern period. It contributed to the Lateran Council of 1512 requiring philosophers to defend the immortality of the soul and the existence of God. In the letter of dedication to his Meditations on First Philosophy, Descartes refers to the Lateran Council to explain, in part, the proofs of God’s existence and immortality found therein. Ficino’s influence can also be seen in many of the most noteworthy philosophers of the sixteenth century, most notably Giordano Bruno, and Francesco Patrizi da Cherso, who held a chair of Platonic philosophy at the University of Ferrara. He indirectly influenced generations of philosophers who encountered Platonism and Hermeticism through his translations and commentaries.

The fortune of Ficino’s philosophical legacy has waxed and waned over the centuries. His influence on intellectual life in the sixteenth century was especially strong, but his brand of Christian Platonism was certainly not without its critics in subsequent centuries. The sixteenth-century theologian and historian Johannes Serranus criticized Ficino’s mode of translating and commenting on Plato’s dialogues, which he thought lacked clarity, brevity, and precision. The self-proclaimed Platonist G. W. Leibniz complains that Ficino’s definitions lack the rigor of Plato’s, and he says that his Neoplatonism incorporates too many pagan elements and is therefore prone to heresy. In his Lectures on the History of Philosophy, G. W. F. Hegel gives Ficino a minor and subordinate role to play in the development of modern philosophy. Hegel argues that Ficino’s revival of Platonic philosophy was ultimately a misguided and childish fascination with a dead philosophy. Perhaps more importantly, however, is the fact that Ficino’s philosophy stands in stark contrast to the methods and explanations employed by the new science in the seventeenth century. Hobbes and Descartes, for example, wanted to explain nature in purely materialistic and mechanical terms. The new philosophy and science, therefore, repudiates the vital core of Ficino’s metaphysics, especially his belief in a World Soul and his vitalistic natural philosophy. Hobbes outright rejects an incorporeal soul, and Descartes completely expels it from nature. Both philosophers, therefore, aspired to explain nature in such a way that it did not include many of the core features of the Ficino’s thought.

For a longtime Ficino remained a marginal figure and a footnote in histories of philosophy. It was not until nearly the middle of the twentieth century, when Paul Oskar Kristeller published his seminal book, The Philosophy of Marsilio Ficino, that historians of philosophy started to re-examine and reconsider Ficino’s importance to the history of Renaissance and early modern philosophies. Kristeller’s book examined the formal structure of Ficino’s philosophy, and he painted a picture of a sophisticated and systematic metaphysician. More recently a number of articles and books have been published on other aspects of Ficino’s thought. Since Kristeller, later scholars—such as D. P. Walker, Frances Yates, and Michael J. B. Allen—have focused less on the systematic and formal philosophy, and more on the magical and creative elements of Ficino’s thought. The critical examination of Ficino, and an assessment of his influence, continues today.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Ficino, Marsilio. Opera Omnia. 2 vols. Basel, 1576.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. The Letters of Marsilio Ficino. Trans. The Language Department of the London School of Economics. 8 vols. London: Shepheard-Walwyn Ltd., 1975-2010.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. The Philebus Commentary. Ed. and trans. Michael J. B. Allen. Berkeley and Los Angeles:  University of California Press, 1975.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. Commentaries on Plato’s Symposium on Love. Trans. Sears Jayne. Dallas: Spring Publications, 1985.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. Three Books on Life. Ed. and trans. Carol Kaske and John Clark. Tempe, Arizona: MRTS, 1998.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. Platonic Theology. Trans. Michael J. B. Allen, and ed. James Hankins. 6 vols. Cambridge: The I Tatti Renaissance Library, Harvard University Press, 2001-2006.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. Commentaries on Plato: Phaedrus and Ion. Cambridge: The I Tatti Renaissance Library, Harvard University Press, 2008.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. All Things Natural: Ficino on Plato’s Timaeus. Trans. Arthur Farndell. London: Shepheard-Walwyn Ltd., 2010.
  • Kristeller, Paul Oskar. Supplementum Ficinianum. 2 vols. Florence: Olschki, 1938.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Allen, Michael J. B. Icastes: Marsilio Ficino’s Interpretation of Plato’s Sophist. Berkeley and Los Angeles:  University of California Press, 1989.
    • A translation of Ficino’s Sophist commentary and discussion of his ontology.
  • Allen, Michael J. B. Synoptic Art: Marsilio Ficino and the History of Platonic Interpretation. Florence: Olschki, 1998.
    • Ficino’s philosophy and the history of later Platonism.
  • Celenza, Christopher. “Pythagoras in the Renaissance: The Case of Marsilio Ficino.” Renaissance Quarterly 52 (1999): 667-711.
    • A study of Ficino’s appropriation of classical Greek philosophy.
  • Collins, Ardis. B. The Secular is Sacred: Platonism and Thomism in Ficino’s Platonic Theology. The Hague: Nijhoff, 1974.
    • An examination of Ficino’s debt to Aquinas, especially the Summa Contra Gentiles.
  • Copenhaver, Brian P. and Charles Schmitt. Renaissance Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992.
    • A detailed and exhaustive study of Renaissance philosophy with a significant discussion of Ficino’s thought.
  • Field, Arthur. The Origins of the Platonic Academy of Florence. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988.
    • A study of the social and intellectual role that the Platonic Academy of Florence.
  • Kristeller, Paul Oskar. The Philosophy of Marsilio Ficino. New York: Columbia University Press, 1943.
    • The authoritative guide to Ficino’s formal philosophy.
  • Hankins, James. Plato in the Italian Renaissance. 2 vols. Leiden: Brill, 1989.
    • The definitive examination of the Renaissance revival of Plato. A complete examination of the Renaissance revival of Plato not limited to Ficino.
  • Snyder, James G. “The theory of materia prima in Ficino’s Platonic Theology.” Vivarium 46 (2008): 192-221.
    • A study of the metaphysics and epistemology of Ficino’s theories of prime and corporeal matter.
  • Snyder, James G. “Marsilio Ficino’s Critique of the Lucretian Alternative.”  Journal of the History of Ideas 72 (2011): 165-181.
    • An examination of Ficino’s critique of Epicurean materialism.
  • Walker, D. P. Spiritual and Demonic Magic: From Ficino to Campanella. London: The Warburg Institute, 1958.
    • An examination of Ficino’s theory of natural magic.
  • Yates, Frances A. Giordano Bruno and the Hermetic Tradition. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1964.
    • Examination of Ficino’s natural magic and the influence it had on Bruno.

Author Information

James G. Snyder
Marist College
U. S. A.


Philosophy’s history of reflection upon knowledge is a history of theses and theories; but no less of questions, concepts, distinctions, syntheses, and taxonomies. All of these will appear in this article. They generate, colour, and refine these philosophical theses and theories about knowledge. The results are epistemological — philosophical attempts to understand whatever is most fundamentally understandable about the nature and availability of knowledge. We will gain a sense of what philosophers have thought knowledge is and might be, along with why some philosophers have thought knowledge both does not and could not exist.

Thus, we will examine some of the general kinds or forms of knowledge that epistemologists have thought it important to highlight (section 1), followed by the idea of knowledge as a kind or phenomenon at all (section 2). Knowledge seems to be something we gain as we live; how do we gain it, though? That will be our next question (section 3), before we ask whether our apparently gaining knowledge is an illusion: might no one ever really gain knowledge (section 4)? Answers to these questions could reflect finer details of knowledge’s constituents (section 5), including the standards involved in knowing (section 6). The article ends by asking about the fundamental point of having knowledge (section 7).

Table of Contents

  1. Kinds of Knowledge
    1. Knowing by Acquaintance
    2. Knowledge-That
    3. Knowledge-Wh
    4. Knowing-How
  2. Knowledge as a Kind
  3. Ways of Knowing
    1. Innate Knowledge
    2. Observational Knowledge
    3. Knowing Purely by Thinking
  4. Knowing by Thinking-Plus-Observing
  5. Sceptical Doubts about Knowing
  6. Understanding Knowledge?
    1. The Justified-True-Belief Conception of Knowledge
    2. Not the Justified-True-Belief Conception of Knowledge?
    3. Questioning the Gettier Problem
  7. Standards for Knowing
    1. Certainty or Infallibility
    2. Fallibility
    3. Grades of Fallibility
    4. Safety and Lucky Knowing
    5. Mere True Belief
    6. Non-Factive Conceptions
  8. Knowing’s Point
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Kinds of Knowledge

We talk of knowledge: all of us do; philosophers do. But what is knowledge? We can best answer that potentially complex question in several stages. Let us begin by considering whether there are different kinds of knowledge. Epistemologists have contemplated at least the following general possibilities.

a. Knowing by Acquaintance

Your knowing a person, it seems, involves direct interaction with him or her. Otherwise, at most, you should claim only that it is almost as if you know him or her: ‘I’ve seen and heard so much about her that I feel like I know her. I wonder whether I’ll ever meet her — whether I will ever actually know her.’ Without that meeting, you could well know facts about the person (this being a kind of knowledge to be discussed in section 1.b). Nonetheless, could you know facts about a person without ever meeting him or her? If so, there could well be a kind of knowledge which is different to knowing a fact; maybe knowing a thing or entity (such as a person) is distinct from knowing a fact about that thing or entity.

Bertrand Russell (1959 [1912]: ch. 5) famously distinguished between knowledge by description and a quite particular kind of knowledge by acquaintance. He allowed there to be a form of acquaintance that was immediate and unquestionable, linking one with such things as abstract properties and momentary sensory items passing before one’s mind: you can be acquainted with the abstract property of redness, as well as with a specific patch of redness briefly in your visual field. Knowledge by description was the means by which, in Russell’s view, a person could proceed to know about what he or she had not experienced directly. We formulate definite descriptions (‘the third man listed in the current Sydney residential phonebook’) and indefinite ones (‘a man listed in the current Sydney residential phonebook’). With these, we can designate individuals with whom we have not interacted. Then we can formulate claims using such descriptions. Some of these claims could be knowledge. Thus, we may open up for ourselves a world of knowledge beyond what is revealed by our immediate experiences.

b. Knowledge-That

Most philosophical discussion of knowledge is directed at knowledge-that — such as knowledge that kangaroos hop, knowledge that koalas sleep most of the time, knowledge that kookaburras cackle, and the like. This is generally called propositional knowledge (a proposition that such-and-such is so is the object of the knowledge), declarative knowledge (the knowledge’s object is represented by a declarative sentence: ‘Such-and-such is so’), or knowledge-that (the knowledge is represented in the form ‘that such-and-such is so’). Knowledge by description (mentioned in section 1.a) would be one form that could be taken by knowledge-that: some known propositions include descriptions; but not all do. In principle, knowledge-that is the kind of knowledge present whenever there is knowledge of a fact or truth — no matter what type of fact or truth is involved: knowledge that 2 + 2 = 4; knowledge that rape is cruel; knowledge that there is gravity; and so on. When philosophers use the term ‘know’ unqualifiedly, knowledge-that is standardly what they mean to be designating. (It will therefore be the intended sense throughout most of this article.)

c. Knowledge-Wh

But should knowledge-that receive such sustained and uninterrupted focus by philosophers? After all, there is a far wider range of ways in which we talk and think, using the term ‘know’. Here are some of them (collectively referred to as knowledge-wh):

knowing whether it is 2 p.m.; knowing who is due to visit; knowing why a visit is needed; knowing what the visit is meant to accomplish; knowing how that outcome is best accomplished; and so forth.

How should these be understood? The usual view among epistemologists is that these are specific sorts of knowledge-that. For example, knowing whether it is 2 p.m. is knowing that it is 2 p.m., if it is; and knowing that it is not 2 p.m., if it is not. Knowing who is due to visit is knowing, for some specified person, that it is he or she who is due to visit. Knowing what the visit is meant to accomplish is knowing, for some specified outcome, that it is what the visit is meant to accomplish. Knowing how that outcome is best accomplished is knowing, for some specified description of how that outcome could be accomplished, that this describes the best way of accomplishing that outcome. And so on.

Still, not everyone will assess these examples in quite that way. Note a variation on this theme that is currently being developed. Called contrastivism, its basic idea is that (perhaps always; at least sometimes) to know is to know this rather than that. (For different versions, see Schaffer 2005; 2007; Morton 2011.) One’s knowing, understood contrastively, is explicitly one’s knowing one from among some understood or presumed bunch of possible alternatives. The word ‘explicitly’ is used here because one would know while acknowledging those alternatives. Consider the example of knowing-who. On contrastivism, you could know that it is Fred rather than Arjuna and Diego who is due to visit; and this might be the only way in which you know that Fred is due. ‘Who is due?’ ‘Fred, as against Arjuna or Diego.’ Your knowing-who would not be simply your knowing, of Fred, that it is he who is due to visit. Your knowing-who would be your knowing that it is Fred as against Arjuna or Diego who is due to visit. This remains propositional knowledge, nonetheless.

d. Knowing-How

Gilbert Ryle (1971 [1946]; 1949) made apparent to other philosophers the potential importance of distinguishing knowledge-that from knowledge-how. The latter is not (thought Ryle) one’s knowing how it is that something is so; this, we noted in section 1.c, is quite likely a form of knowledge-that. What Ryle meant by ‘knowing how’ was one’s knowing how to do something: knowing how to read the time on a clock, knowing how to call a friend, knowing how to cook a particular meal, and so forth. These seem to be skills or at least abilities. Are they not simply another form of knowledge-that? Ryle argued for their distinctness from knowledge-that; and often knowledge-how is termed ‘practical knowledge’. Is one’s knowing how to cook a particular meal really only one’s knowing a lot of truths — having much knowledge-that — bearing upon ingredients, combinations, timing, and the like? If Ryle was right, knowing-how is somehow distinct: even if it involves having relevant knowledge-that, it is also something more — so that what makes it knowledge-how need not be knowledge-that. [For more on this issue, see, for example, Bengson and Moffett 2012). Might knowledge-that even be a kind of knowledge-how itself, so that all instances of knowledge-that themselves are skills or abilities (for example, Hetherington 2011a: ch. 2)?]

2. Knowledge as a Kind

Section 1 shows how there might be different kinds of knowledge. We will now focus on one of them — knowledge-that. What kind of thing is such knowledge? In particular, is it a natural kind — a naturally occurring element in the scientifically describable world? Alternatively, is knowledge at least partly a conventional or artifactual kind — a part of our practices of judging and evaluating, possessing a socially describable nature?

The former idea portrays knowledge as an identifiable and explanatory aspect of what it is for beings relevantly like us to function as a natural component of a natural world. We have beliefs, some of which help us to achieve our aims by telling us how not to ‘bump into’ the world around us. We can ‘fit into’ — by ‘finding our way within’ — the world by using beliefs. Is that because these beliefs are knowledge? Is that part of why humans as a natural kind (if this is what we are) have prospered so markedly? In introducing epistemologists to the idea of what he called a naturalized epistemology, W. V. Quine (1969) recommended that philosophy conceive of us in psychological terms, so that when it seeks to understand us as reasoning, as believing, and as rational, it does not do this in terms distinct from those scientific ways of describing our psychological and physical features. Hilary Kornblith (2002) continues that theme: in effect, we know as other animals do — limitedly but reliably, thanks to our roles as sensing and believing beings operating within the world’s natural order. There would be natural laws, say, or at least natural regularities — scientifically formulable ones, we may hope — about how we know.

In contrast, we may feel that knowing is a distinctively conventional accomplishment. It might consist of socially constituted and approved patterns — not thereby natural laws or regularities admitting of scientific description — in aspects of how we interact with other people. Perhaps we can collectively choose what to count as knowledge. Perhaps that is all there is to knowing. Such a view could even say that this is how knowledge differs from belief: beliefs happen to or within us; knowledge we shape from beliefs. And we might do this deliberatively, subjecting ourselves and others to social norms of inquiry, responding to other people and their concepts, aims, and values. As civilizations expand and mutate, could knowing change not only its content (that is, what is known), but its basic nature (for example, how the knowing occurs and even what in general is required for it to occur)? Different social arrangements would bring into being different ways of thinking and acting, new aims and values. In that sense, possibly knowledge is an artefact, created by us in social groupings, used by us in those same groupings — often wittingly and deliberately so. In short, maybe knowing is a matter of functioning in socially apt ways. Barry Allen (2004) is one who argues for an artifactual interpretation of knowing’s nature.

The rest of this article will remain neutral between these two broad ideas. Some of the suggestions to be considered will be more appropriate (and clearly so) for one than the other of the two. But in general the article’s aim will be to display, not to favour.

3. Ways of Knowing

To say the least, not everyone knows everything, not even everything that in principle is knowable. Individual instances of knowledge come to individual people at individual times, remaining in place for varying — individual — lengths of time. So it is right to ask how it is that individual cases of knowledge reach, or are acquired by, people; along with how it is that these cases of knowledge are then retained by people. In what broadly characterisable ways do people gain and maintain their knowledge? In practice, philosophers do not treat that as a question about the ineliminable specificities of each person, each moment, and each particular piece of knowledge. It is treated as a question about general ways and means of coming to know a specific fact or truth.

Over the centuries, these have been some of the more philosophically pondered forms of answer to that question:

  • Some or all knowledge is innate. (And then it is remembered later, during life.)
  • Some or all knowledge is observational.
  • Some or all knowledge is non-observational, attained by thought alone.
  • Some or all knowledge is partly observational and partly not — attained at once by observing and thinking.

The rest of this section will consider these in turn.

a. Innate Knowledge

If some instances of knowledge accompany a person into life, how will they reveal themselves within his or her life? How would the person, or indeed anyone else, know that he or she has this innate knowledge? It could depend on what is being known innately — the subject matter of this knowledge with which the person has been born.

For example, if people begin life already knowing some grammatical rules (an idea famously due to Noam Chomsky: see Stich 1975, ch. 4), this innate knowledge would be shown in subsequent speedy, widespread, and reliable language-learning by those involved. These instances of people learning so readily and predictably would be actions expressing some knowledge-how. But (as section 1.d acknowledged) such manifestations of knowledge-how might actually reflect the presence within of knowledge-that.

Or consider another possible example: knowledge of some mathematics and some logical principles. Seemingly, Plato (in the Meno, one of his dialogues) accorded people this sort of innate knowledge; as did Leibniz, in his New Essays. (For excerpts from Plato and from Leibniz, see Stich 1975, ch. 2.) Plato presented us with a story of a slaveboy, lacking education, whom Socrates brought, via minimal questioning, to a state of remembering some geometrical knowledge.

Naturally, it could be difficult to ascertain that any particular knowledge is genuinely innate. Knowledge which is not innate, but which is acquired especially easily, seemingly effortlessly, might nonetheless feel innate. And (as section 1.d also acknowledged) even when an action, such as of language-learning, is manifesting knowledge-how, there remains a philosophical question as to whether that action is reflecting knowledge-that already existing within, dormant until activated. The answer to that question might be that there is only knowledge-how present — without owing its existence to some related prior knowledge-that. (As ever throughout this article these possibilities are suggested for continued consideration, not as manifestly decisive refutations.)

b. Observational Knowledge

One of epistemology’s perennially central topics has been that of observational knowledge. Let us consider a few of the vast number of philosophical questions that have arisen about such knowledge.

Can there be purely or directly observational knowledge? When you observe a cat sleeping in front of you, do you know observationally — and only observationally — that the cat is sleeping there? Observation is occurring; and you do not consciously ‘construct’ the knowledge. Still, is there a perceptual experience present, along with some conceptual or even theoretical knowledge (for example, that cats are thus-and-so, that to sleep is to do this-and-not-that, and so forth)? Otherwise, how could your experience constitute your knowing this-content-rather-than-another? Is conceptual knowledge what gives knowledgeable content to your observational experience? Is this so, even for experiences that are as simple as you can imagine having?

Can there be foundational observational knowledge? Wilfrid Sellars (1963) engaged famously with this question, confronting what he called the myth of the given. Part of the traditional epistemological appeal of the idea of there being purely or directly observational knowledge was the idea that such knowledge could be foundational knowledge. It would be knowledge given to us in experiences which would be cases of knowledge, yet which would be conceptually simple. Sellars argued, however, that they would not be conceptually so simple.

For example, imagine knowing observationally that here is something white. This would possibly be as simple, in conceptual terms, as observational knowledge could be for you. Nevertheless, even here the question remains of whether you are applying concepts (such as of being here, of being something, and of being white); and if you are doing so, of whether you must be able to know that you are using them correctly. Would you need to find even simpler observational experiences, via which you could know what these concepts involve? If so, the other experience — knowing observationally that here is something white — would not have been foundational. That is, it would not have amounted to a basic piece of knowledge, upon which other pieces of knowledge can be based and which need not itself be based upon other pieces of knowledge.

How much observation is needed for observational knowledge? When you look at what appears to be a cat, for how long must you maintain your gaze if you are to know that you are seeing a cat? Do you need also to walk around it, still looking at it, scrutinising it from different angles, if you are to know that you are seeing a cat? And what of your other senses? Could the animal’s sounding or smelling like a cat, for example, be needed if the knowledge in question is to be yours? There is a more general question behind those ones: What standard must observational knowledge meet? You are using, it seems, observational evidence; what standard must it meet, if it is to be giving you observational knowledge? (And that sort of question will arise about all evidence and all knowledge. That will become apparent as this article proceeds.)

[For a range of readings on observational knowledge, see Dancy 1988.]

c. Knowing Purely by Thinking

When philosophers ask about the possibility of some knowledge’s being gained purely by thinking — by reflection rather than observation —  they are wondering whether a priori knowledge is possible. Historically, those who believe that some such knowledge is possible are called rationalists about knowledge. (Empiricists, in contrast, believe that all knowledge is observational in its underlying nature, even when it might not seem so. This is the belief that all knowledge is a posteriori — present only after some suitably supportive observations are made.) As was done for observational knowledge in section 3.b, this section mentions a few of the multitude of questions that have arisen about a priori knowledge — knowledge which would be present, if it ever is, purely by thinking, maybe through an accompanying rational insight.

How would there be a priori knowledge? It is difficult, to say the least, for us ever to know that a piece of putative knowledge would not be at all observational, so that it would be gained purely by thought or reflection. We talk of pure mathematics, for example, and our knowledge of it. Consider the content of the sentence, ‘2 + 2 = 4.’ It could be applied to physical objects; nonetheless, we might deny that it is at all about such objects. But then we must explain how we know that we are using thought alone in knowing that 2 + 2 = 4, rather than knowing this mathematical truth in a way which is simply much less directly observational. Would we know it, for instance, partly by knowing how to interpret various physical representations which we would observe — numerals (‘2’ and ‘4’) and function signs (‘+’ and ‘=’)? If this is even part of how we know that 2 + 2 = 4, is the knowledge at least not purely a result of thought rather than observation?

[On related issues, see Quine’s ‘Two Dogmas of Empiricism’, in Moser 1987, a collection with many readings relevant to this section.]

Could a priori knowledge be substantive? It might be thought that pure reflection — and hence a priori knowledge — is possible when the truths being known are especially simple, even trivial. ‘All bachelors are unmarried’ is true, yet trivial: it is uninformative for anyone who understands at all the concept of a bachelor. ‘There is more than one infinity’ is true yet not trivial: it is informative for some who understand at all the concept of an infinitude. If ‘There is more than one infinity’ is knowable by thought alone, that would be substantive a priori knowledge. But if only truths like ‘All bachelors are unmarried’ are knowable purely by thinking, maybe there cannot be substantive a priori knowledge. So, which is it to be? (If we reply that it depends upon what a particular a priori known truth is about, we return to the previous paragraph’s question about knowledge gained purely by thinking. Alternatively, if we reply that it depends upon which standard is being met — such as when understanding a specific concept like that of bachelorhood or of infinitude, so as to gain knowledge from it — this takes us to the next paragraph’s question.)

[Classically, the issue of whether there can be substantive a priori knowledge was posed by Immanuel Kant, in his eighteenth-century Critique of Pure Reason (2007 [1781/1787] — as the question of whether there can be synthetic a priori knowledge.]

What standard would a priori knowledge have to satisfy? If there could be a priori knowledge, is it clear what standard it would need to have satisfied? There have long been philosophers for whom part of the appeal in the idea of a priori knowledge is the presumption that it would be infallible. That is, it would satisfy a conclusive — in effect, a perfect — evidential standard. It would do this because a capacity for pure thought, undistracted by observed contingencies within this world, would be what has provided the a priori knowledge. However, some recent epistemologists (for example, BonJour 1998) regard that picture as overly optimistic. The one person is both observing and thinking; and if we expect fallibility to be part of how she observes, maybe we should expect fallibility likewise when she is thinking. Is it simply obvious that when we are not observing, only thinking, we are more — let alone perfectly — reliable or trustworthy in our views? Or do we also think only imperfectly? Perhaps we need observations as ‘checks’ on what could otherwise become thoughts ‘floating free’ in our minds. Yet maybe, even so, these ‘checks’ remain imperfect. To think without observing might not be to improve dramatically, if at all, the use of one’s mind.

d. Knowing by Thinking-Plus-Observing

And so again we meet the question of the extent to which, in one way or another, we are vulnerable when trying to gain whatever knowledge we can. Of course, we might claim that we are only vulnerable when focussing just on observation or on reflection — ignoring the other. Surely (it will be suggested), much or even all of our knowledge is a mixture — both observational and reasoned. Is that how we will stride forward as knowers?

Optimism replies, ‘Yes. Possibly there are philosophical limits upon the effectiveness of observation by itself and of reason by itself. Still, to combine them is to overcome those limits, or at least enough of them.’ In response to which, less-than-optimism counsels, ‘Maybe not. If each of observation and reflection has limitations of its own, a combination of them might compound those weaknesses. The result could be a blurring of the two, so that we would never know whether, on a particular occasion, weakness in one — in the observing or in the reflecting — is weakening the whole.’ Which of those alternatives is right? Optimism? Less-than-optimism?

That depends. We should now consider an epistemologically classic doubt about people’s abilities ever to gain knowledge.

4. Sceptical Doubts about Knowing

From the outset of philosophical thinking about knowledge, doubts have never been far away: do we really know what we think we know? And that question was not meant merely to ask whether sometimes we are mistaken in claiming a particular piece of knowledge. The philosophical concern was more pressing: do we ever know what we think we know? Even when lacking all views on whether we know, could we always fail to know? Is knowledge an attainment forever beyond us — all of us, everyone, all of the time?

That question confronts us with a radical sceptical possibility. Possibilities that are less radical but still possibly disturbing, and less widely sceptical but still sceptical, have also been discussed. Is there no knowledge of a physical world? Is there no scientific knowledge? Is there no knowledge of moral truths? Is there no knowledge of the future? And so it goes. Let us now examine one of these. It is one of philosophy’s most famous non-radical sceptical arguments — a scepticism about external world knowledge. (It is sceptical, partly because it denies something otherwise accepted by almost everyone: sceptical denials are surprising in that sense.) Here is how it unfolds.

If there is observational knowledge (section 3.b), it is knowledge of what philosophers generally call the external world. By this, they mean to designate the physical world, regarded as something with an existence and nature distinct from (and perhaps, or perhaps not, represented accurately in) any individual’s beliefs as to its existence and nature. Those beliefs could be true because there is a physical world with a nature matching what the beliefs attribute to it. Equally, however, the beliefs could be false because there is no physical world quite, or even at all, as the beliefs claim it to be. And if the beliefs are false, the usual philosophical moral to be drawn would be that they are not knowledge. (Knowledge is only of truths or facts: see section 6.f.)

Still, do we ever have reason to regard all of our beliefs about the physical world as actually false? Perhaps not consciously so, while ever in fact we have the beliefs; for part of having a belief is some sort of acceptance of its content as true, not false. Nevertheless, maybe one can have a belief while accepting that one cannot know quite how one has gained that belief. And this is significant because there are ways of having a belief which — even without guaranteeing the belief’s being false — would be incompatible with the belief’s being knowledge. For instance, even if one feels as though a particular belief has been formed via careful reasoning, perhaps ultimately that belief is present largely because one wants it to be. And one might concede this, even if reluctantly, as a possibility about oneself. More generally, therefore, maybe one could have a belief while also accepting one’s not quite being able to know that one has not gained it in a way which is wholly unsuitable for its being knowledge.

In theory, there are many possible knowledge-precluding ways of gaining a particular belief. Here are a few generically described ways:

  • Sometimes, your individual sensing or thinking might be only yours, in the worrying sense that it could be misleading on the particular topic of your belief, more so than other people’s sensing or thinking would be on that same topic.
  • Sometimes, anyone’s sensing is only human, in the sense that it could be misleading about aspects of the world which other animals sense more accurately.
  • Human reasoning is also only ever human in the sense that (as Christopher Cherniak has explained: 1986) even some seemingly simple assessments could be computationally beyond our capacities. There is only so much that any person’s brain can do with so much data. Even checking for something as familiar as consistency between many of one’s beliefs is an extremely complex task. This is not necessarily because consistency in itself is always complex. It is because there is too much checking to do, given the need to evaluate every possible combination from among one’s beliefs.

Sceptical arguments could be generated from those and from comparable possibilities.

One historically prominent suggestion — philosophers usually attribute its most influential form to Descartes (1911 [1641]), in his ‘Meditation I’ — directs us to the phenomenon of dreaming. Suppose that you feel as though you are sensing, in a normal way, a cat’s sitting in front of you. But suppose that this experience is actually present as part of your dreaming, not as part of using your senses in a normal way. There seems to you to be a cat; the circumstance feels normal to you; even so, in fact you are asleep, dreaming. Presumably, therefore, your feeling or experience at this time is not providing you with knowledge right now of the cat’s presence.

Now, could that be how it is on every occasion of your feeling there to be a cat in front of you? Indeed, we can generalise that question, to this philosophical challenge: Whenever you seem to be having a sensory experience about the world around you, can you know that you are not dreaming at that time? And this question is a challenge, not only a question, because it might not be clear how you could have that knowledge of not dreaming at that time. Any evidence you mention in support of the contention that you are not dreaming will be the same sort of evidence as that which has just been questioned. Imagine thinking to yourself, ‘I remember waking up this morning. I feel awake still. I feel so awake.’ You thereby feel as though you are mentioning some good evidence, reflecting decisive non-dreaming experiences. But your having that feeling could itself be present as part of your dreaming; and if it is, then it is not knowledge. So, any such experience on your part of reaching for apparently good evidence, of bringing to mind how awake you feel, will merely be more of the same. That is, it will be just another instance of the same sort of experience as was being questioned in the first place; and it will be no less vulnerable to the possibility of merely being part of a more or less extended moment of dreaming by you. Your citing these further experiences thus provides no new form of evidence which is somehow above suspicion in this context of questioning the apparently observational evidence (the suspicion, remember, of possibly being an experience produced as part of a dreaming experience).

Then the sceptical conclusion follows swiftly. If you never know that your apparent experiences of the physical world around you are not present as part of your dreaming while asleep, you never know that what feels to you like a normally produced belief about the world is not present as part of an experience which precludes that you are thereby having a belief at this time which is knowledge. Accordingly, for all that you do know about yourself at that time, you fail to have knowledge of your surroundings. In that sense, you might not have knowledge of the physical world around you. Do your apparent beliefs about the world fail in that way to be knowledge? Indeed so, concludes the sceptical reasoning: if (for all that you do otherwise know about them) they might not be knowledge, then they are not sufficiently well supported by you to actually be knowledge.

[On external world scepticism in particular, see Stroud (1984: ch. 1). On scepticism and dreaming, see Sosa (2007: ch. 1). On sceptical reasoning in general, see DeRose and Warfield 1999.]

5. Understanding Knowledge?

There are various possible ways of seeking philosophical understanding of a phenomenon. One such approach involves attempting to understand the phenomenon in terms of other phenomena. If one can do this exhaustively and with full precision, one might even attain a definition of the phenomenon. Sometimes that method is called the search for an analytic reduction of the phenomenon in question. (It is also often described as analysing the concept of that phenomenon. But the associated aim should thereby be to understand the phenomenon itself: hopefully, we would understand X by having a full and precise understanding of what it takes for something to satisfy the concept of X.) That approach has dominated epistemology’s efforts over the past fifty or so years to understand knowledge’s nature.

a. The Justified-True-Belief Conception of Knowledge

In 1963, a short paper was published which highlighted — while questioning strikingly — a way of trying to define knowledge. Section 5.b will present the question raised by that paper. Right now, we should have before us a sense of what it questioned — which was a kind of view that has generally been called the justified-true-belief conception of knowledge.

That conception was usually presented as a definition. The thinking behind it took this form:

Consider someone’s knowing that such-and-such is the case. This instance of knowing amounts, by definition, to the person’s having a true and well justified belief that such-and-such is the case.

So, three distinct phenomena are identified (even if only in a generic way), before being combined. And that combination is being said to be what any — and only any — case of knowledge exemplifies. Knowledge is a belief; but not just any belief. Knowledge is always a true belief; but not just any true belief. (A confident although hopelessly uninformed belief as to which horse will win — or even has won — a particular race is not knowledge, even if the belief is true.) Knowledge is always a well justified true belief — any well justified true belief. (And thus we have the justified-true-belief conception of knowledge.)

What does ‘justified’ mean? That is a substantial topic in its own right, but it is not the topic of this article. Still (for illustration only), here are two possible forms that justification can take within knowledge:

Evidence. Often, you have evidence — supportive experiences and views, consciously held — which, overall, favours your belief that such-and-such is the case. This evidence is thereby justification for or towards your belief’s being true. (On justification as evidence, see Conee and Feldman 2004.)

Reliability. Often, you have formed your belief that such-and-such is the case in a way which was likely to have led you to form a true belief. This reliability is thereby justification for or towards your belief’s being true. (On reliability as justification, see Goldman 1979.)

Must such justification — be it favourable evidence or be it reliability in belief-formation — be perfect support for or towards the belief’s being true? Section 6.a will discuss that idea; the usual answer is ‘No, perfection is not needed.’ At the very least, that answer was part of the underpinning to the famous 1963 questioning of the justified-true-belief conception of knowledge.

[Epistemology textbooks standardly present some version of a justified-true-belief conception of knowledge: for example, Chisholm 1989; Hetherington 1996; Feldman 2003; Morton 2003; Zagzebski 2009.]

b. Not the Justified-True-Belief Conception of Knowledge?

Edmund Gettier’s 1963 article had a dramatic epistemological impact — as immediately so as is possible within philosophy. Almost all epistemologists, at the time and since, have agreed that Gettier disproved the justified-true-belief conception of knowledge. How so?

He proposed two supposed counterexamples to the claim that a belief’s being true and well justified is sufficient for its being knowledge. In each of his imagined cases, a person forms a belief which is true and well justified, yet which — this is the usual view, at any rate — is not knowledge. (These situations came to be known as Gettier cases, as did the many subsequent kindred cases.) For instance, in Gettier’s first case a person Smith forms a belief that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket. Smith’s evidence is that the company president told him that Jones would get the job, and that Smith has counted the coins in Jones’s pocket. Is Smith’s belief true? Yes, it is; but only because he himself will get the job and because he himself has ten coins in his pocket — two facts of which he is actually unaware.

Why is a belief like Smith’s not knowledge? Many theories have been proposed, as to why such beliefs (Gettiered beliefs, as they have come to be called) are not knowledge. Collectively, this post-Gettier theorising has generated another independently large epistemological topic — the Gettier problem. But none of those theories are favored here because epistemology as a whole has not favored one. There has been widespread agreement only on Gettier cases being situations from which knowledge is absent — not on why or how the knowledge is absent.

[For an extensive exposition of the first twenty years of epistemology’s engagement with the Gettier problem, including a range of theories that were proposed as to why Gettiered beliefs are not knowledge, see Shope 1983. For recent accounts, see Lycan 2006 and Hetherington 2011b.]

c. Questioning the Gettier Problem

A few forms of doubt have been advanced about the potency of Gettier’s challenge. Such doubts, if correct, could allow philosophers to return to a view — a pre-Gettier view — of knowledge as being some sort of justified true belief. Let's consider two of those forms of doubt.

A more varied range of intuitions is needed. In reacting to Gettier’s own two cases and to the many similar ones that have since appeared, epistemologists have continually relied on its being intuitively clear that the cases’ featured beliefs are not instances of knowledge. In response to case after case, epistemologists say that ‘intuitively’ the belief in question — the Gettiered belief — is not knowledge.

Yet that sort of reaction has begun to be questioned by some work that initiated what has since become known as experimental philosophy. Rather than continuing to rely only on what epistemologists and their students would say about such thought-experiments, Jonathan Weinberg, Shaun Nichols, and Stephen Stich (2001) asked a wider range of people for their intuitive reactions, including to some Gettier cases. This wider range included people not affiliated with universities or colleges, along with more people of a non-European ancestry. And the results were at odds with what epistemological orthodoxy would have expected. For example, interestingly more respondents of a Subcontinental ancestry (Indian, Pakistani, Bangladeshi) than ones of a Western European ancestry replied that the Gettiered beliefs about which they were being asked are instances of knowledge.

This does not prove that Gettiered beliefs are knowledge, of course. But it complicates the epistemological story: to whom — to whose intuitions, if to any — should we be listening here? Some philosophers are beginning to wonder whether such a result should even undermine their confidence in knowledge’s being something more than a justified true belief — in particular, its being a non-Gettiered justified true belief.

[For discussions of the nature and role of intuitions within philosophy, see DePaul and Ramsey 1998. On intuitions and epistemology, see Weinberg 2006.]

The need to be fallibilist in assessing the knowledge’s absence. Gettier introduced his challenge (section 5.b) as concerning precisely what knowledge is if its justification component is not required to be producing infallibly good support for or towards the belief’s being true. Section 6 will focus upon a range of possible standards that knowledge could be thought to need to meet. Fallibilism is one of them; for now, we need note only that it functions explicitly within Gettier’s challenge as a constraint upon knowledge.

For example, in Gettier’s first case Smith’s evidence (the company president’s testimony, and Smith’s counting the coins in Jones’s pocket) justifies only fallibly his final belief (that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket). By this, Gettier meant that the evidence does not logically mandate or entail the belief’s being true: the belief could have been false, even given that evidence’s being true. In fact, the belief is true. But how is it made true? It is made true, we saw, not by aspects of Jones, but by aspects of Smith himself — none of which are noticed by his evidence. Accordingly, the fallibility within the case amounts to a ‘gap’ of logic or information between the evidence-content’s being true and the final belief’s truth. This gap allows the case’s final belief to be true because of something other than what is reported in the evidence. And so that final belief is not knowledge.

Yet here is a counter-challenge (described more fully in Hetherington 2011c). When thinking that the case’s final belief is not knowledge, could epistemologists unwittingly have been applying a higher standard to the case than a fallibilist one? Is it possible that to deny Smith this knowledge is to assume, even if not deliberately, an infallibilist standard instead? It will not feel to an epistemologist as if this is happening. Yet could it be, even so? How would an epistemologist know that an infallibilist standard is not what is being applied, even if only implicitly and even if she is claiming explicitly to be applying a fallibilist standard? Ultimately, epistemologists have relied on appeals to intuition as a way of monitoring their more theoretical interpretations of Gettier cases. And (as we found a moment ago) there is a question about how decisive that is as a way of knowing exactly what epistemological moral to take from the cases.

Here is an alternative possible fallibilist interpretation of Gettier’s case about the job and the coins. Although there is a ‘gap’ of logic or information between what Smith’s evidence and reasoning claims to tell him about directly (that is, aspects of Jones) and how his final belief is made true (that is, by aspects of Smith himself), some such ‘gap’ is sometimes to be expected whenever a merely fallibilist standard for knowing is at stake. So (continues this interpretation), if the presence of a fallibilist standard was the only shortcoming in the case, we should not dismiss the belief as failing to be knowledge; for that would be simply an infallibilist dismissal of the belief.

We must acknowledge, however, that something more than mere fallibility is present within the case: only through some actual oddity does Smith’s true belief (the final belief) eventuate within the case. Hence, the question is one of whether that combination — the fallibility and the oddity — should be allowed by fallibilism as being knowledge nonetheless. Of course knowledge would rarely, even at most, be fallibly present in such an odd way; could it ever be, though? Normally it would not be; abnormally, however, could it be? So, could there be knowledge like this? Might a Gettiered belief be knowledge? Even if it is rare, is it possible?

Some epistemologists have argued that what such cases show is the need for the justification within a belief’s being knowledge somehow to guarantee the truth of the belief (for example, Zagzebski 1994). But we should ask whether this is evading rather than solving Gettier’s challenge. (Howard-Snyder, Howard-Snyder, and Feit argue that it is also not needed for solving Gettier’s challenge: 2003.) That question arises because Gettier is challenging only justified-true-belief conceptions of knowledge which include a fallibilist form of justification. Our correlative aim, if we accept the usual reading of Gettier cases, should be to formulate a satisfactory conception of that form of knowledge.

[On the nature of fallibilism, see Hetherington (2005) and Dougherty (2011).]

6. Standards for Knowing

Many philosophical questions about knowledge (its nature and availability) may be treated as questions about standards. We expect knowledge to amount to something, to be an improvement in some respect upon various forms of non-knowledge. (Why is that so? Section 7 will discuss what knowledge is for, hence why it should meet any particular standard.) Section 5 ended by asking about knowledge and infallibilism; we may now consider a wider range of possible standards, beginning with infallibility, which have at times been placed by epistemologists and others upon knowing.

a. Certainty or Infallibility

There is a recurring temptation, often felt by philosophers and non-philosophers alike, to impose some kind of infallibilist standard upon knowing. This can even feel intuitive to the person applying the standard. One version of that temptation talks of certainty — not necessarily a subjectively experienced sense of certainty, but what is usually termed an epistemic kind of certainty. The latter amounts to the certainty’s being a rationally inviolable and unimprovable form of justificatory support, regardless of whether it feels so perfect. (It could also be experienced as certainty. That would not be the important aspect of its being part of the knowing, though.)

Why would one adopt such a demanding view of knowledge? Perhaps because the alternative could feel too undemanding. Consider the apparent oddity of claims like this:

I do know that I’m looking at a dingo, even though I could be mistaken.

(One could talk in that way because one might implicitly be thinking, ‘My evidence isn’t perfect.’) Is that concessive knowledge-attribution, as it is often called, a contradiction? If it is, perhaps knowing is incompatible with possibly being mistaken; in which case, knowledge does have to involve an epistemic certainty. What epistemologists in general regard as the most famous advocacy of knowing’s including such certainty was by Descartes, again in his ‘Meditation I’ (1911 [1641]).

Of course, there remains the possibility that knowing is merely incompatible with saying or thinking that one is possibly mistaken — not with the fact of one’s possibly being mistaken. This is why the oddity of concessive knowledge-attributions might not entail knowledge’s including certainty or infallibility. The matter is currently being debated (for example, Dougherty and Rysiew 2009).

b. Fallibility

The spectre of a sceptical conclusion is the most obvious philosophical concern about requiring knowledge to satisfy an infallibilist standard. If knowledge is like that, then how often will anyone succeed in actually having some knowledge? Rarely, if ever (is the usual reply). For people’s imperfections in their attempts to know (see the examples highlighted early in section 4) will be incompatible with the success of those attempts — if perfection is required for such success. Anyone who accepts infallibilism about some or all knowledge must confront the question of whether he or she wants thereby to deny that any such knowledge is ever actually attained. (Descartes wished not to be a sceptic, for example, even as he allowed that some knowledge, if it was to be present, would have to be certain.)

So there is a key choice, between infallibility and fallibility, in what standard we are to require of knowing. To demand infallibility is to court the danger of scepticism. Again, though (as section 6.a acknowledged), settling for fallibility may seem overly accommodating of the possibility of mistake. This is a substantial choice to make in thinking philosophically about knowledge. Most epistemologists profess not to be infallibilists. They aim to understand knowing as needing only to satisfy a fallibilist standard. Think of everyday situations in which people attribute knowledge: ‘I know that you are a good person. And I know that you are sitting down.’ The knowledge being attributed is not being thought to involve infallibility. Nonetheless, we do claim or attribute knowledge casually yet literally, all day, every day. In practice, we are fallibilists in that respect. (Still, in practice we also often could have infallibilist moments: ‘You’re not sure? Then you don’t know.’ The situation is complex. Maybe we are not always consistent about this.)

c. Grades of Fallibility

What any fallibilist could helpfully do, therefore, is to ascertain which standard of fallibility is the minimum one that must be met by any instance of knowing. So far, the discussion has been about fallibility, not different standards of fallibility. But in theory the latter way of talking is available. After all, fallibility is merely an absence of infallibility; and there might be many possible standards available to be met, each of which would fall short to some or another extent of the absolute achievement constituted by infallibility. Consider three ideas that have been proposed.

Animal knowledge; reflective knowledge. Maybe we can distinguish between a kind of knowledge which involves some sort of reliability (see section 5.a above), and one which adds to that reliability an appropriately aware reflectiveness about that reliability. Sosa (2009) describes this as a distinction between animal knowledge and reflective knowledge; and he regards the latter as a better way of knowing a truth. In principle, each kind of knowledge can be fallible (although an infallibilist, such as Sosa himself, can also accept the distinction). What matters for the present discussion is that you could know a particular truth, such as that you are tired, in either an animal way or a reflective way. But your reflective knowledge of being tired will be a better grade than your animal knowledge of being tired. The reflectiveness would improve your epistemic relationship to the fact of your being tired. Nevertheless, that relationship would remain one of knowing. So the knowing would improve as knowledge of the particular fact of your being tired. You would know that fact less fallibly, by knowing it more reflectively.

Knowledge-gradualism. That talk of improving the knowing should be suggestive for a fallibilist. Maybe we can allow there to be many grades or degrees of fallibility — reflecting, for instance, the multiply varied extents to which evidence can support a belief well. Think of a body of observational data: your belief could receive improved support if the data proceeded to be supplemented by further corroborative observations. Similarly, think of hearing expert testimony — and then more of it, by even better experts — in support of a thesis. The idea of improving one’s evidence, or one’s reliability in attaining true beliefs, is perfectly compatible with already having good support for a particular belief. A belief could be more, or it could be less, fallibly supported — yet well supported all the while.

Then we might also say that the knowledge itself is improved. The belief would already be knowledge, with there being good enough justificatory support for it. But its quality as knowledge of the particular truth in question would correspond to the degree or grade of its fallibility, such as of the fallibility in its justification component. And this degree or grade could improve, as the fallibility is lessened by the improvement in the justificatory support. For example, you know better that it is raining, if you see that it is and you feel its doing so. You still know — but less well — that it is raining, if you only see that it is. In each case, your knowledge is fallible; it remains knowledge, though. [For more on this idea, see Hetherington (2001; 2011a). See Hetherington (2011a: sec. 2.7) on others who have accepted it.

Contextualism. In recent years, contextualism has attracted much philosophical attention, especially within epistemology (for example, Cohen 1986; 1991; DeRose 1999; 2009; Lewis 1996). It is a way of claiming to understand the truth-conditions of utterances or thoughts, particularly of knowledge-attributions or knowledge-denials. And it is often thought to accommodate the existence of different standards for knowledge-attributions. It has mainly focussed on this sort of comparison:

  • In an ‘everyday’ conversational context, when she is asked whether you know that dingoes exist, your friend may well say of you that you do.
  • In a conversational context where sceptical possibilities are being taken seriously, when she is asked that same question, your friend may well deny that you know that dingoes exist.

This disparity, according to contextualism, reflects different standards (or something similar) being applied within the respective contexts. A lower and more accommodating standard for applying the term ‘knows’ to you is presumed within the everyday context; not so in the sceptically-aware context.

Note that contextualism, as a kind of theory of knowledge-attributions or knowledge-denials, is not directly a kind of theory of knowing. It is a theory directly about language use and meaning (specifically, occasions of talking or thinking while using the word ‘knows’ and its cognates); in that sense, it is not directly about knowing as such. Contextualism is mentioned here because some epistemologists (for example, Stanley 2005) have thought that if we were to countenance there being different grades of (fallible) knowing, this is how we would have to do so. Such a thought is mistaken, though, even if we regard contextualism as indirectly a theory of knowing. For we have already met two approaches that are directly about knowing (animal/reflective knowledge, and knowledge-gradualism) while also accepting the possibility of there being different grades of fallible knowing.

d. Safety and Lucky Knowing

Even if we accept that knowledge can be fallible (section 6.b) and even if we accept that there can be different grades of (fallible) knowledge (section 6.c), we might still be concerned about the possibility of being too generous in according people knowledge. (The concern would be about the possibility of generosity’s triumphing over accuracy.) In particular, some epistemologists (for example, Prichard 2005) will insist that a moral to be learnt from the Gettier problem (section 5.b above) is that (fallible) knowledge is never present when some kinds of luck are involved in the presence of that true belief, given that justification. In this respect, can there be lucky knowledge — accurate and justified, but only luckily accurate (even given that justification)? Epistemologists usually deny that knowledge could be like that. Recently, their denial has tended to take the form of specifying that knowledge has to be safe — a condition failed, we are then told, by those beliefs found within Gettier cases:

Safety. A true belief is safely formed just in case, given how it has been formed, it would have been formed only if true.

But is that sort of condition really failed in Gettier cases? This depends on how we describe the way, within a given Gettier case, in which the final true belief has been formed. For example, it would be natural to say that in Gettier’s own first case (section 5.b above), Smith forms his belief — that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket — by listening to the company president and by counting coins in Jones’s pocket. Yet to form that belief on that basis is to proceed in a way that was likely to yield not only Smith’s same belief, but its being true. Hence, Safety does not obviously tell us why Smith’s belief — by being unsafely formed — is not knowledge.

Instead of Safety, therefore, what the epistemologically usual interpretation needs to require is something a little more complicated, along these lines:

Safety+. A true belief is safely formed just in case, given how it has been formed and given the surrounding circumstances in which it has been formed, it would have been formed only if true.

Does that show us why the usual interpretation of Gettier cases is correct? We should consider two possible answers to this question.

Yes, it does.’ The usual interpretation might say that Smith’s surrounding circumstances include the facts that he himself will get the job and that he himself has ten coins in his pocket — facts of which Smith is ignorant. He has formed his belief (that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket) on the basis only of evidence about Jones — none of which describes how Smith’s belief is in fact made true (by facts about Smith). And in general a belief is formed unsafely if it is formed by overlooking facts that make the belief true. Thus, given how Smith’s belief is formed, it was likely not to be formed as true. This explains why the belief is not knowledge.

No, it does not.’ We might say instead that, although Smith’s circumstances (which include the facts, overlooked by him, that he himself will get the job and that he himself has ten coins in his pocket) are odd, in fact they render even more likely his forming the same final belief along with the belief’s being true. After all, those circumstances now include the details constituting that final belief’s being true — the details of how it is true, details about Smith himself. So (on this alternative interpretation), Smith’s final belief is not formed unsafely. The belief’s failing to be knowledge (if it does fail to be) is therefore not explained by its being formed unsafely.

As the preceding two paragraphs show, competing interpretive possibilities exist here. It might be advisable, then, for us to be cautious about embracing the idea that an anti-luck condition like Safety or even Safety+ impels us towards the usual interpretation of Gettier cases. Those conditions might not reveal the impossibility of lucky knowledge, at least not on the basis of Gettier cases. [For debate on this, see Pritchard 2012 and Hetherington 2012.]

e. Mere True Belief

Section 5.a assumed that knowledge is at least a justified true belief. Gettier’s challenge, in section 5.b, was to knowledge’s never needing to be anything more than a justified true belief. But must knowledge be even as much as a justified true belief? In this section and the next, we will encounter a few epistemologically heterodox ways in which people have sometimes regarded knowledge, in principle at any rate, as able to be less than a justified true belief.

Here is one of those ways of drastically lowering the standard required for knowing:

Knowledge need not be anything beyond a true belief.

On that suggestion (for example, Sartwell 1991; 1992), justification — be it good evidence; be it good reliability; be it both or neither — is not needed as part of knowing. Accordingly, even when justification is in fact present and supporting a particular true belief, it was never needed for the mere presence of knowledge. This is because the belief, by being true, would be knowledge anyway, irrespectively of whether there was also justification supporting the truth of the belief. (What does the justification do in such a case? Even if it was not needed for the knowledge’s mere presence, could its presence improve the knowing? That is, could it strengthen the knowing’s grade? This would exemplify section 6.c’s idea of knowledge-gradualism.)

Might that be how knowledge is? Few epistemologists will accept so, although developed arguments against that picture are also few. The standard form of argument is an appeal to normality of linguistic usage, even intuitions: ‘Intuitively, knowledge is something more than only a true belief. Otherwise, every confident and lucky guess is knowledge!’ Is that sort of point decisive? Section 5.c raised the question of how much we should credit ourselves with having a faculty of intuitive insight into knowledge’s nature. Moreover, Alvin Goldman (1999) shows how, if we allow a weak sense of knowledge (whereby such knowledge is required only to be at least a true belief), we can still accommodate how people in many fields of inquiry and policy beyond philosophy purport to talk — apparently constructively, within those fields — of knowledge.

f. Non-Factive Conceptions

When people talk casually of knowledge, sometimes they reflect a non-factive conception of it. (Philosophers almost never talk in this way of knowledge, but at times others do.) Any non-factive conception of knowledge allows this idea:

Knowledge need not be even a true belief. (Even if it is always a belief or something related, truth is not essential for knowing.)

Here are two ways of expanding upon that idea.

Mere socially justified belief. Maybe being socially justified is enough to make a belief knowledge. That is, what most people within a particular social grouping would accept is thereby knowledge for that grouping; and knowledge would only ever be knowledge for some or another grouping, and in such a way.

Mere professionally justified belief. Some such social groupings are also professional groupings (for example, of physicists, of physicians, of high school teachers, of carpenters, and so forth). Within that kind of social grouping, being widely accepted is enough to make a belief knowledge.

Those proposals share the idea that nothing beyond acceptance within a designated group need be expected of a view if it is to be knowledge. Insisting on truth as an additional condition of the view’s being knowledge would be needless (according to these non-factive conceptions of knowledge), perhaps because any attempt within a group to ascertain whether the accepted view is true would itself need to be accepted within the group. Such acceptance would remain paramount in practice. (We might even want to say that truth is thereby being ascertained, precisely because truth is whatever is accepted widely by one’s fellow speakers and peers. For an influential instance of that pragmatist approach to conceiving of knowledge and truth, see Rorty 1979. But it is far from clear that many classical pragmatists would share that approach: see Bernstein 2010.)

Of course, we may also wonder whether those ways of talking of justification are too lenient in what they allow to be knowledge. The key question is that of whether a group could be not only mistaken in a shared belief, but even unreliable in how they form and try to support it. If so, could that belief actually be unjustified, no matter that the group’s members take it to be justified? This would be so, if justification is a kind of actual reliability (section 5.a) in being correct — reliability which even an entire group might therefore lack when sharing a particular belief.

Yet some people (even if probably no epistemologists) might wish to understand knowledge in an even more deflationary way. Here are two such approaches:

Mere sincere belief. Is it enough — for knowledge — that a person sincerely believes something to be so? Yes.

Mere sincere feeling. Is it enough — for knowledge — for a person to feel something to be so? Yes.

Suppose someone claims to have a specific piece of knowledge. Yet when asked for supporting evidence, she provides none. No matter; she claims anyway to have the knowledge: ‘I really do believe it. I sincerely feel it to be so. That’s enough for knowledge, isn’t it?’

Well, is it? Often the dictates merely of manners or friendliness dictate our not engaging critically with such claims of knowledge. So as to be polite, for example, you refrain from telling someone that his or her claim, made carefully to you, is insufficiently justified and hence is not knowledge. But epistemology professes to focus more upon accuracy and knowledge than cheeriness and decorum. Could you unwittingly be condescending or patronising, indeed, when forbearing to assess critically whether the other person really knows? To allow his or her mere claim or belief — simply because he or she feels it sincerely — to be knowledge is possibly to trivialise the notion of knowledge. Even if this is done with the intention of respecting the person (by not questioning him or her critically), the result could be to trivialise or somehow to lessen the status of the person in that setting. This is because the person would not be being treated as someone whom there is even a point in subjecting to a higher standard (such as of being genuinely justified or definitely correct). Think of how proper it could be to adopt this undemanding approach if the person was a child, or was otherwise mentally incapable of appreciating and striving to meet the higher standard. Equally, therefore, think of how improper it would be to do this if the person is not incapable of such an aim and effort — such as if he or she is a cognitively capable adult.

7. Knowing’s Point

With those reflections, we reach the question of what knowing is for. If we are to understand what knowledge is (what kind of thing it is; what its components or features are), along with whether and how it is available to us, we should reflect upon what role knowing would play within the lives of knowers. One way of doing so is to confront the question of what value there is in knowing — its inherent value, if there is any. Jonathan Kvanvig (2003) calls this the value problem within epistemology.

That issue first appeared in Plato’s Meno, as the question of how knowledge is more valuable than merely true belief. How is it more valuable, if it is, for you to know that you are hungry than merely to believe accurately that you are hungry? That question is not intended to be only or even about subjective value, such as about how grateful or pleased you may be, in a given case, to have knowledge rather than something lesser. The question concerns whatever value knowing has for a person, even if he or she does not realise that the value is present. Briefly consider a few possible ways of trying to answer that question.

Virtue epistemology. We might regard knowing as a person’s having manifested various virtues of an intellectual nature. These could be more, or they could be less, narrowly characterised. For example, an intellectual virtue may involve a cognitive faculty that is intellectually reliable (this phenomenon was mentioned in section 5.a); or, less narrowly, an intellectual virtue can reflect more of one’s being generally solicitous and respectful towards truth. And one’s manifesting such virtues would be a personal achievement. It would reflect well in general, to some non-trivial extent, upon one as an inquirer. In this sense, knowing could be an inherent part of personal development. In knowing, is one better as a person (all else being equal)? [For instances of this way of thinking, see Zagzebski 1996; Sosa 2007; Greco 2010.]

Reliable informants. Anyone with knowledge is potentially helpful to others, by being — inherently so — a reliable source of information. In a similar but restricted way, so too is a thermometer (Armstrong 1973: ch. 12); and, realising this, we create thermometers expressly for that purpose. Do we regard knowers analogously, primarily as reliable repositories of information for others? And do we create knowers likewise, when interpreting people as knowers? See section 2 above for the idea of knowledge as an artefact, created socially to serve conventionally significant purposes. In this sense, is knowing an inherent part of how people function socially? And is that valuable in itself? [On the idea of knowers as reliable informants, see Craig 1990. On knowing via testimony, see Coady 1992 and Lackey 2008.]

Usefulness. Knowledge can be used in various ways, some of which could well contribute significantly to the functioning of our lives. And this might be an intrinsic feature of knowing. That is, part — not just a consequence, but a part — of your knowing a specific truth could be that truth’s mattering to your life. You would not know it to be true simply by caring about its being true, for instance: wishful thinking is not knowing. But the importance to your life of that truth might affect what justificatory standard would need to be met, if you are to know it to be true. In this sense, perhaps satisfying some of one’s practical aims or needs is an inherent part of each case of one’s knowing. Equally, perhaps part of any knowing’s value is thereby its inherently satisfying some personal aims or needs. [For a later version of this idea, sometimes called pragmatic encroachment within knowing, see Fantl and McGrath 2009.]

A normative standard for assertions and other actions. Might knowledge (irrespective of whatever else exactly it is or does) function as a normative standard for much that we do? For example, maybe assertion is apt only when expressing or reflecting knowledge. Perhaps even a much wider range of actions is apt only when they are expressing or reflecting knowledge. In this sense, possibly knowing is an inherent contributor to our living as we should — so that we are performing various actions, such as assertion, only when our doing so is apt. [For these ideas about knowledge’s functioning as a normative standard, see Williamson 2000. On Williamson’s epistemology, see Greenough and Pritchard 2009.]

And thus we have a few possible proposals as to knowing’s possible point, bearing upon what knowledge’s inherent value could be. We might blend some or all of them with ideas from earlier in the article, ideas bearing upon knowing’s nature. Some of those combinations will be more natural than others; unless, of course, none of them will be even a little natural. We should not forget the possibility of knowing’s failing to have a point or value in itself. Maybe it will lack, at any rate, all value beyond whatever value is inherent in the presence of a true belief — in one’s being correct at all in a belief about something at all.

Let's close with another idea, touching upon those others:

Existing with value. Perhaps there are few, if any, particular facts which one needs to know in order to exist. But imagine existing while knowing nothing. (Maybe this would reflect a combination of circumstances. First, possibly some of your beliefs would be false. Second, if knowledge is more than true belief — something questioned in section 6.e — then perhaps you would have true beliefs which fail in a further way to be knowledge. Third, presumably some truths escape your attention altogether.) Quite possibly, we would regard such an existence — wholly empty of knowing — as somehow devalued, somehow failing. Bear in mind that there could still be actions and opinions aplenty within your life; but (given the imagined scenario) never would there be knowledge either in them or guiding them. And if such an existence would be a failure to that extent, then perhaps the inherent point or value in knowing a particular truth is the point or value in knowing at all — with this being, in turn, some more or less substantial part of the point or value in living at all.

That proposal is highly programmatic. It would make knowing’s value personal, in an existential way. It would be one’s existing’s having a value which it would otherwise lack (if it was not to include knowing). Hopefully, there are other potential sources of value within a life. But maybe knowing is one aspect of living with value. Without knowing, possibly one’s living lacks part of its possible point — regardless of how, more specifically and fully, we describe that point.

This suggestion, although vague, is substantive enough to imply that if one was to know nothing then to a correlative extent (however far that extent reaches) one would not be alive in a valuable way. To that same extent, one’s living at all would be devalued inherently. (One might not feel or notice its being so. But it would in fact be so.) Hence, the suggestion has the following explanatory implication, for a start. It could help to illuminate why sceptical doubts (such as in section 4) have been a part of philosophy for so long. That could also be why such doubts should remain present within philosophy, at least as hovering dangers to be defused if possible — and also, if ever defused, to remind us of dangers thereby past. In effect, sceptical doubts question whether our lives, no matter what else we do or accomplish within these, are imbued with as much value as we would otherwise assume to be ours. This threat does not make the sceptical doubts correct, but it might cloak them with a living potency, an existential urgency. It does remind us of why the alternative should be sought: Knowing would be our protection against that potential emptiness within our lives.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Allen, Barry. 2004. Knowledge and Civilization. Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Armstrong, D. M. 1973. Belief, Truth and Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bengson, John and Moffett, Marc A. (Eds.). 2012. Knowing How: Essays on Knowledge, Mind, and Action. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bernstein, Richard B. 2010. The Pragmatic Turn. Cambridge: Polity.
  • BonJour, Laurence. 1998. In Defense of Pure Reason: A Rationalist Account of A Priori Justification. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cherniak, Christopher. 1986. Minimal Rationality. Cambridge: The MIT Press.
  • Chisholm, Roderick M. 1989. Theory of Knowledge. 3rd ed. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice Hall.
  • Coady, C. A. J. 1992. Testimony: A Philosophical Study. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Cohen, Stewart. 1986. “Knowledge and Context.” The Journal of Philosophy 83, 574-585.
  • Cohen, Stewart. 1991. “Skepticism, Relevance, and Relativity.” In B. P. McLaughlin, ed., Dretske and His Critics. Cambridge: Blackwell, 17-37.
  • Conee, Earl and Feldman, Richard. 2004. Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Craig, Edward. 1990. Knowledge and the State of Nature: An Essay in Conceptual Synthesis. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Dancy, Jonathan. (Ed.). 1988. Perceptual Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • DePaul, Michael R. and Ramsey, William. (Eds.). 1998. Rethinking Intuition: The Psychology of Intuition and its Role in Philosophical Inquiry. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • DeRose, Keith. 1999. “Contextualism: An Explanation and Defense.” In J. Greco and E. Sosa, eds., The Blackwell Guide to Epistemology. Malden, Massachusetts: Blackwell, 187-205.
  • DeRose, Keith. 2009. The Case for Contextualism: Knowledge, Skepticism, and Context, Volume 1. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • DeRose, Keith and Warfield, Ted A. (Eds.). 1999. Skepticism: A Contemporary Reader. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Descartes, René. 1911 [1641]. “Meditation I.” In E. S. Haldane and G. R. T. Ross, eds. and trans., The Philosophical Works of Descartes, Volume I. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dougherty, Trent. 2011. “Fallibilism.” In S. Bernecker and D. Pritchard, eds., The Routledge Companion to Epistemology. New York: Routledge, 131-143.
  • Dougherty, Trent and Rysiew, Patrick. 2009. “Fallibilism, Epistemic Possibility, and Concessive Knowledge Attributions.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 78, 123-132.
  • Fantl, Jeremy and McGrath, Matthew. 2009. Knowledge in an Uncertain World. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Feldman, Richard. 2003. Epistemology. Upper Saddle River, New Jersey: Prentice Hall.
  • Gettier, Edmund L. 1963. “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” Analysis 23, 121-123.
  • Goldman, Alvin I. 1979. “What is Justified Belief?” In G. S. Pappas, ed., Justification and Knowledge: New Studies in Epistemology. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1-23.
  • Goldman, Alvin I. 1999. Knowledge In a Social World. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Greco, John. 2010. Achieving Knowledge: A Virtue-Theoretic Account of Epistemic Normativity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Greenough, Patrick and Pritchard, Duncan. (Eds.). 2009. Williamson on Knowledge. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 1996. Knowledge Puzzles: An Introduction to Epistemology. Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2001. Good Knowledge, Bad Knowledge: On Two Dogmas of Epistemology. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2005. “Fallibilism.” In J. Fieser and B. Dowden, eds., The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ISSN 2161-0002, .
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2011a. How To Know: A Practicalist Conception of Knowledge. Malden: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2011b. “The Gettier Problem.” In S. Bernecker and D. Pritchard, eds., The Routledge Companion to Epistemology. London: Routledge, 119-130.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2011c. “The Significance of Fallibilism Within Gettier’s Challenge: A Case Study.” Philosophia. DOI: 10.1007/s11406-011-9340-7.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2012. “There Can Be Lucky Knowledge.” In M. Steup and J. Turri, eds., Contemporary Debates in Epistemology, 2nd ed. Malden: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel, Howard-Snyder, Frances, and Feit, Neil. 2003. “Infallibilism and Gettier’s Legacy.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 66, 304-327.
  • Kant, Immanuel. 2007 [1781/1787]. Critique of Pure Reason, 2nd ed., trans., N. K. Smith. Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Kornblith, Hilary. 2002. Knowledge and its Place In Nature. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Kvanvig, Jonathan L. 2003. The Value of Knowledge and the Pursuit of Understanding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lackey, Jennifer. 2008. Learning From Words: Testimony as a Source of Knowledge. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Lewis, David. 1996. “Elusive Knowledge.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74, 549-567.
  • Lycan, William G. 2006. “On the Gettier Problem Problem.” In S. Hetherington, ed., Epistemology Futures. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 148-168.
  • Morton, Adam. 2003. A Guide Through the Theory of Knowledge, 3rd ed. Malden: Blackwell.
  • Morton, Adam. 2011. “Contrastivism.” In S. Bernecker and D. Pritchard, eds., The Routledge Companion to Epistemology. London: Routledge, 513-522.
  • Moser, Paul K. (Ed.). 1987. A Priori Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Pritchard, Duncan. 2005. Epistemic Luck. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Pritchard, Duncan. 2012. “There Cannot Be Lucky Knowledge.” In M. Steup and J. Turri, eds., Contemporary Debates in Epistemology, 2nd ed. Malden: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Quine, Willard V. 1969. “Epistemology Naturalized.” In W. V. Quine, Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. New York: Columbia University Press, 69-90.
  • Rorty, Richard. 1979. Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1959 [1912]. The Problems of Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1949. The Concept of Mind. London: Hutchinson.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1971 [1946]. “Knowing How and Knowing That.” In G. Ryle, Collected Papers, Volume II. London: Hutchinson, 212-225.
  • Sartwell, Crispin. 1991. “Knowledge Is Merely True Belief.” American Philosophical Quarterly 28, 157-165.
  • Sartwell, Crispin. 1992. “Why Knowledge Is Merely True Belief.” The Journal of Philosophy 89, 167-180.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan. 2005. “Contrastive Knowledge.” In J. Hawthorne and T. Gendler, eds., Oxford Studies in Epistemology, Volume I. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 235-271.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan. 2007. “Knowing the Answer.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 75, 383-403.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid F. 1963. “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind.” In W. F. Sellars, Science, Perception and Reality. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 127-196.
  • Shope, Robert K. 1983. The Analysis of Knowing: A Decade of Research. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2007. A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume I. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2009. Reflective Knowledge: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume II. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Stanley, Jason. 2005. Knowledge and Practical Interests. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Stich, Stephen P. (Ed.). 1975. Innate Ideas. Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Stroud, Barry. 1984. The Significance of Philosophical Scepticism. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Weinberg, Jonathan M. 2006. “What’s Epistemology For? The Case for Neopragmatism in Normative Metaepistemology.” In S. Hetherington, ed., Epistemology Futures. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 26-47.
  • Weinberg, Jonathan, Nichols, Shaun, and Stich, Stephen. 2001. “Normativity and Epistemic Intuitions.” Philosophical Topics 29, 429-460.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2000. Knowledge and Its Limits. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Zagzebski, Linda T. 1994. “The Inescapability of Gettier Problems.” The Philosophical Quarterly 44, 65-73.
  • Zagzebski, Linda T. 1996. Virtues of the Mind: An Inquiry Into the Nature of Virtue and the Ethical Foundations of Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Zagzebski, Linda T. 2009. On Epistemology. Belmont: Wadsworth.


Author Information

Stephen Hetherington
University of New South Wales

Philosophy of History

History is the study of the past in all its forms. Philosophy of history examines the theoretical foundations of the practice, application, and social consequences of history and historiography. It is similar to other area studies – such as philosophy of science or philosophy of religion – in two respects. First, philosophy of history utilizes the best theories in the core areas of philosophy like metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics to address questions about the nature of the past and how we come to know it: whether the past proceeds in a random way or is guided by some principle of order, how best to explain or describe the events and objects of the past, how historical events can be considered causally efficacious on one another, and how to adjudicate testimony and evidence. Second, as is the case with the other area-studies, philosophy of history investigates problems that are unique to its subject matter. History examines not what things are so much as how they came to be. History focuses on the unique rather than the general. Its movers are most often people who act for a variety of inner motives rather than purely physical forces. Its objects are no longer observable directly, but must be mediated by evidence. These problems and many more that are specific to the past have been studied and debated for as long as philosophy itself has existed.

This article presents the history of philosophy of history from Ancient Greece to the present, with particular emphases on the variety of 19th century philosophy of history and on the divide between continental and Anglophone or analytic philosophy of history in the 20th century.

Table of Contents

  1. Ancient through Medieval
  2. Humanism through Renaissance
  3. Enlightenment through Romanticism
  4. 19th Century Teleological Systems
  5. 19th Century Scientific Historiography
  6. 19th Century Post-Kantian Historiography
  7. 20th Century Continental
  8. 20th Century Anglophone
  9. Contemporary
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Classical Works in English Translation
    2. Prominent Scholarship and Collections

1. Ancient through Medieval


The attempt to derive meaning from the past is as old as culture itself. The very notion of a culture depends upon a belief in a common history that members of that culture recognize themselves as meaningfully sharing. Whether it be an interpretation of events as products of divine intervention or whether it be the secular uniting of families or of nations, history has always been a sort of glue for a culture’s fabric.

Arguably the first scientific philosophy of history—which is characterized by an attempt to be non-biased, testimony-based, comprehensive, and unencumbered by grand predictive structures— was produced by the father of history, Herodotus (c. 484-425 BCE). The word ‘history’ derives from his usage of historía to define his ‘inquiries’ or ‘researches’: “Herodotus of Halicarnassus, his inquiries are here set down to preserve the memory of the past by putting on record the marvelous achievements both of the Greek and non-Greek peoples; and more particularly, to show how the two races came into conflict” (Herodotus, Histories I.1,1). To attain his comprehensive characterization of the Greek and non-Greek worlds, Herodotus’ research depended on the often fabulous oral traditions of his predecessors. But what he sacrifices in confirmable fact he makes up for in the descriptive vividness of everyday life. All stories, however preposterous, are recorded without moral judgment since they each reflect the beliefs of a time and of a people, all of which are worth knowing.

While Greece and Rome produced a number of important historians and chroniclers, none were more comprehensive or more influential than Thucydides (c.460-c.395 BCE). Like Herodotus, Thucydides viewed history as a source of lessons about how people tended to act. And like him, too, Thucydides was concerned with how methodological considerations shaped our view of the past. However, Thucydides was critical of Herodotus for having failed to carry out a sufficiently objective account. “To hear this history told, insofar as it lacks all that is fabulous, shall perhaps not be entirely pleasing. But whoever desires to investigate the truth of things done, and which according to the character of mankind may be done again, or at least approximately, will discover enough to make it worthwhile” (Thucydides, The Peloponnesian War I, 22). To remedy Herodotus’ uncritical record, first, Thucydides restricted his inquiry to the main actors of the Peloponnesian War: the generals and governors who decided what was to be done rather than the everyday people who could only speculate about it. The lesson to be learned was not the sheer diversity of cultural behaviors but the typological character of agents and their actions, which was to serve as a sort of guide to future conduct since they were likely to repeat themselves. Second, Thucydides treated his evidence with overt skepticism. He claims to not accept hearsay or conjecture, and to admit only that which he had personally seen or else had been confirmed by multiple reliable sources. Thucydides was the first to utilize source criticism in documentary evidence. The lengthy and eloquent speeches he ascribes to various parties are preserved only under the promise that they follow as closely as possible the intention of their alleged speaker.

With the waning of classical antiquity came the decline of the scientific paradigm of history. The religious practice of sacred-history in the Judeo-Christian and Islamic worlds, though often interpreting the same key events in very different ways, share common meta-historical principles. The past is not studied for the sake of disinterested truth, but in the hope of attaining a glimpse of the bond between the divine plan and a given people’s course in the world. In that sense, many non-fundamentalist historians of each faith regard their sacred texts as meaningful documents meant for consideration in the light of the present and what its authors believe to be our common future. Under the surface chronicle of events like floods, plagues, good harvests, or benevolent rulers is seen a moral and spiritual lesson provided by god to his people, which it is the historian’s task to relate. As the Qur’an makes clear, “In their history, there is a lesson [‘ibra] for those who possess intelligence” (Qu’ran 12:111).

The most reflective of the early medieval historiographers is doubtless Augustine (354-430). In opposition to Thucydides’ aim to show the repeatability of typical elements from the past, Augustine’s emphasized the linearity of history as a part of the Christian eschatology, the necessary unfolding of God’s eternal plan within a temporally-ordered course of history. His City of God (413-26) characterizes lives and nations as a long redemption from original sin that culminates in the appearance of Christ. Since then, history has been a record of the engaged struggle between the chosen elect of the City of God and the rebellious self-lovers who dwell in the City of Men. Because time is linear, its key events are unique and inviolable: the Fall of Adam, the Birth and Death of Jesus, and the Resurrection all move history along to the Final Judgment with infallible regularity.

Sacred-history thus tends to provide an overarching narrative about the meaning of human existence, either as a tragedy or a statement of hope in a redeemed future. Besides its canonical status throughout much of the Medieval world, its influence manifestly stretches over the hermeneutical tradition as well as the teleological philosophers of history of the Nineteenth Century.

2. Humanism through Renaissance

Petrarch’s (1304-1374) De secreto conflict curarum mearum (c.1347-c.1353) argued that secular intellectual pursuits, among them history, need not be spiritually hazardous. His circle of followers recovered and restored a mass of ancient texts the likes of which the previous millennium had not imagined, among them the histories of Cicero, Livy, Tacitus, and Varro. At the beginning of the 15th century, humanist universities expanded from their scholastic core to include rhetoric, poetry, and above all, history. And with their greater concern for the things and people of the natural world came an increasing focus on political history rather than grand religious narratives. Accordingly, the common focal point was not the Resurrection of Christ, but the fall of Rome. And here the lesson of history was not a consistent moral decline, but a hope that understanding Ancient models of social and political life would make room for a sort of secular golden age.

With the new focus on human affairs, there came an increased attention to written records and natural evidence. Armed with newly unlocked troves of secular literary artifacts, the works of Leonardo Bruni (c.1370-1444) and Flavio Biondo (1392-1463) contain the first forays into modern source criticism and demands for documentary evidence. And for Bruni’s History of the Florentine People (1415-39), the story to be told was neither a spiritual nor a moral one, but a natural history of the progress of political freedom in Florence.

Though less nationalistic than these, Desiderius Erasmus, too, demanded that historians trace their sources back to the originals, not just in government documents but in cultural artifacts as well. And that meant investigating the religious spirit of sacred history with the tools of Renaissance humanism. His Latin and Greek translations of the New Testament are monuments of scholarly historiography, and became instrumental for the Reformation. History, for Erasmus, became a tool for critiquing modern misinterpretations and abuses of the once noble past and a means for uncovering the truth about long-misunderstood people, ideas, and events.

But although previous writers of history were reflective about their enterprise, the first to merit the name Philosopher of History is Giambattista Vico (1668-1744). He is the first to argue for a common historical process that guides the course of peoples and nations. In the Scienza Nuova, he writes:

Our Science therefore comes to describe at the same time an ideal eternal history traversed in time by the history of every nation in its rise, progress, maturity, decline, and fall. Indeed we go so far as to assert that whoever mediates this Science tells himself this ideal eternal history only so far as he makes it by that proof, ‘it had, has, and will have to be’. For the first indubitable principle above posited is that this world of nations has certainly been made by men, and its guise must therefore be found within the modifications of our own human mind. And history cannot be more certain than when he who creates the things also describes them. (Vico 1948, 104)

Vico’s philosophy of history follows from his epistemological postulate that to know something fully required understanding how it came to be. The true is precisely that which has been made, expressed in his Latin as Verum esse ipsum factum. Since natural objects were not made by the scientists who study them, their nature must remain to some degree mysterious. But human history, since its objects and its investigators are one and the same, has in principle a methodological advantage. That division between the natural sciences and human sciences was in conscious contradistinction to Descartes’ methodological universalism; and it would become crucial for 19th century Post-Kantian philosophers of history and, later, for the British Idealists.

Vico also suggests that the cultured minds of his day were of a different order than those of their primitive ancestors. Whereas his 18th century thinkers form abstract concepts and universal propositions, to the primitive individual images and sounds directly indicate the real things to which they refer. While for Post-Kantian philosophers lightning is a symbol or metaphor for Zeus, to Vico’s poetic imaginers the lightning really is Zeus. To perfectly reconstruct both their mentality and their history by the principles of rationalist science or enlightenment historiography  is impossible. A new science of the imagination is required, one that can symbolically recapture past people’s forms of thoughts and re-embody their emotions.

Because of these epistemological views, Vico is the first to posit distinct epochs of history in which all nations evolve due to an overarching scheme of logic. Each stage of a nation’s development produces a newly-believed system of natural law, use of language, and institution of government. It is ‘providence’ that causes the transition in every nation from an Age of Gods, wherein people believe themselves directly governed by divine signs and spoke only in a direct object language, to an Age of Heroes wherein aristocrats hold commoners in thrall by their natural superiority and speak in metaphoric images, and then to an Age of Men, wherein people communicate with abstract generalities and assume both a general equality in their social associations and an abstract notion of justice by which they are governed. It is our fate as human beings in every nation to live out this ‘corso’ of history, this progression of mental capacities from fantasia to riflessione.

Ultimately the ideal epoch of reason and civilization is never reached. At our most civilized, history circles back upon itself in a ‘ricorso’ to a ‘second barbarism’. Here in this barbarism of reflection, aided by civil bureaucracy, deceitful language, and cunning reason, our passions are unrestrained by the manners and customs prominent in the Ages of Gods or Heroes to the point that civil society collapses upon itself before returning to a second cycle of history.

3. Enlightenment through Romanticism

In contrast to Vico’s pessimism, the philosophy of history in the 18th century is continuous with the Enlightenment ideals of moral progress and the power of reason. Voltaire’s (1694-1778) Essay on the Customs and the Spirit of the Nations (1756), wherein the phrase ‘philosophy of history’ is supposed to have been coined, was the first attempt since Herodotus to write a comprehensive history of world culture in a non-Christian and non-teleological framework. Social and cultural history replaced military and political history with a trans-religious and trans-European tenor intended to showcase the spiritual and moral progress of humanity. To further rid Europe of what he considered Christian biases, on display especially in the modern eschatology of Jacques Bénigne Bossuet (1627-1704), Voltaire was the first major modern thinker to stress Arab contributions to world culture. In keeping with the Enlightenment, he believed that the best remedy for intolerance and prejudice was simply the truth, something which is best discovered by the objective historian working with original documents, never by the ideologue repeating the dicta of authorities. But for his apologies for non-biased historiography, Voltaire betrays rather clearly the ideals of his age. Differences between the Christian eschatological worldview and his own age’s rationalist science are regarded summarily as improvements, whereas the medieval destruction of the ancient clearly represents decline. The age of reason is, for Voltaire, the standard by which other eras and peoples are to be judged, though few could be said to have reached.

Antoine-Nicolas de Condorcet (1743-1794) openly embraced Enlightenment progressivism. Like Voltaire, his Sketch for a Historical Picture of the Progress of the Human Mind (published posthumously in 1795) viewed the past as a progress of reason, but was more optimistic about the inevitable progress of liberal ideals such as free speech, democratic government, and the equity of suffrage, education, and wealth. The point of history was not only a description of this progress. Because the progress is lawful and universal, history is also predictive and, what is more, articulates a duty for political institutions to work toward the sort of equalities that the march of history would bring about anyway. The historian is no mere critic of his time, but also a herald of what is to come. Widely influential on the French Revolution, Condorcet also made a significant impression on the systematizing philosophies of history of Saint-Simon, Hegel, and Marx, as well as laid the first blueprints for systematic study of social history made popular by Comte, Weber, and Durkheim.

Less revolutionary was Immanuel Kant’s (1724-1804) Idea of a Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View (1784). Kant begins from the Enlightenment view of history as a progressive march of reason and freedom. But given his epistemology he could not presume, as did Voltaire and Condorcet, that the teleological progression of history was empirically discernible within the past. It is not a demonstrable fact, but a necessary condition for the meaningfulness of the past to posit teleological progress as a regulative idea that allows us to justify the many apparent evils that have sprung up within history despite the overall benevolent character of creation. The wars, famines, and natural disasters that pervade history should be seen as nature’s instruments, guiding people into the kinds of civil relationships that eventually maximize freedom and justice. History reveals human culture as the means by which nature accomplishes its state of perpetual peace in all the spiritual pursuits of mankind.

Johann Gottfried Herder (1744-1803) was key in the general turn from Enlightenment historiography to the romantic. His Ideas toward a Philosophy of History of Humanity (1784-91) echoes Vico’s contention that there is no single faculty of human reason for all peoples at all times, but different forms of rationality for various cultures as determined by their particular time and place in the world. Accepting Vico’s notion of necessary development, he nevertheless rejects the Enlightenment emphasis on rationality and freedom as its measures. Herder also discards the Enlightenment tendency to judge the past by the light of the present, irrespective of how rational we consider ourselves today. This results from his fundamental conviction that each national culture is of equal historical value. The same inner vitalism of nature guides all living things on the regular path from birth to death. Just as childhood and old age are essential to the development of the person, are valuable in their own right, and thus should not be judged as somehow inferior from the standpoint of adulthood, so too a nation’s character is of inviolable worth and essential to the development of the whole.

Herder not only rejected Kant’s Enlightenment universalism, but also the epistemological means by which an understanding of ancient people can be reached. It was clear that there could be no empirical proof or rationalist demonstration of the organic pattern of the development Herder finds. Nor, however, should we posit teleological progress as a merely regulative principle of reason. The sense for past people and cultures is not itself communicated whole and entire through their documents in such a way that would be open to historical analysis or source criticism. The historian only apprehends the real spirit of a people through a sympathetic understanding – what Herder calls Einfühlen— of their inner life by analogy with her own. The historian ‘feels her way into’ a people and an age, in order to try to sympathetically apprehend why they made the choices they did.

Romantic historiographers were strongly guided by Herder’s idea that the definition of a people lay more in its inner spirit than its legal borders. The fairy tales of the Grimm brothers (1812), as much as the nationalistic histories of Macaulay (1800-1859), the Wilhelm Tell (1804) saga of Friedrich Schiller (1759-1805), J.W.v. Goethe’s (1749-1832) Goetz von Berlichingen (1773), the transcription of the Beowulf epic (1818), and the surge of histories asserting the sanctity of minority Russio-slavic cultures like the Estonian Kalevipoeg (1853) or the Armenian Sasuntzi Davit (1873) each sought to revitalize and unify present culture under the banner of a shared past. The Romantics followed Herder, too, in their belief that this national character was not discernible solely by meticulous analysis of documents and archival records. The historian must have an overarching sense of the course of history of a people, just as the dramaturge reveals the unity of a character through each individual episode. Hardly a bare chronicle of disconnected facts, the narratives historians tell about the past should communicate a sense of spirit rather than objective information. And only those who ‘breathe the air of a people or an age’ have the proper sort of sympathetic understanding to interpret it correctly. The potential abuses of historiography, to which this nationalistic romanticism lends itself, had a decisive impact on the three main streams of philosophy of history in the 19th century.

4. 19th Century Teleological Systems

The name of G.W.F. Hegel (1770-1831) is nearly synonymous with philosophy of history in two senses, both captured by his phrase, “The only thought which philosophy brings with it, in regard to history, is the simple thought of Reason—the thought that Reason rules the world, and that world history has therefore been rational in its course” (Hegel 1988, 12f). History unfolds itself according to a rational plan; and we know this precisely because the mind which examines it unfolds itself from the first inklings of sense-certainty to absolute knowing in a regular teleological pattern. The same process that governs the movement of history also governs the character of the philosophical speculation inherent in that moment of history. And at the present epoch of philosophical speculation we are capable of understanding the entire movement of history as a rational process unfolding an ever greater awareness of rational freedom. A true account of the whole of reality, which is itself the sole endeavor of philosophy, must consider everything real as real insofar as it can be comprehended by reason as it unfolds within its necessary historical course. Reason is, for Hegel, the real. Both are understood as historical.

Hegel’s lecture series on the Introduction to the Philosophy of History (published posthumously in 1837) is a sort of secular eschatology, wherein the course of reality is considered a single epochal evolution toward a providential end. This is cognized by an increasingly unfolding awareness according to that same plan. As he demotes religion to a subservient place to absolute knowing in his Phenomenology of Spirit (1807), so too does Hegel replace the sacred-history conception of grace with the phenomenological unfolding of reason.

Hegel’s view of the common structural unveiling of reason and history leads to specific consequences for his teleological historiography. Reason consists in both the awareness of contradiction and its sublimation by means of the speculative act of synthesis which results in an increased self-recognition. Analogously, the development of history consists in a progressive structure of oppositions and their necessary synthetic sublimations which leads to an ever increasing self-awareness of freedom. That necessary movement is illustrated in his account of three distinct epochs of world history. In the ancient orient, only the despot is free; his freedom consists only in the arbitrary savagery of his will. The people are held in bondage by the identity of state and religion. The opposition of the despot and his subjects is to some degree overcome by the classical Greek and Roman recognition of citizenship, under which the free individual understands himself to be bound by honor over and above the laws of the state. Still, the great many in the classical world are still un-free. It is only in the intertwining of the Christian recognition of the sanctity of life and the modern liberal definition of morality as inherently intersubjective and rational that guarantees freedom for all. “It was first the Germanic Peoples, through Christianity, who came to the awareness that every human is free by virtue of being human, and that the freedom of spirit comprises our most human nature” (Hegel 1988, 21).

The critics of Hegel have been as passionate as his disciples. Of the former we may count Thomas Carlyle (1795-1881) and the historical school at Basel: J.J. Bachofen (1815-1887), Jacob Burckhardt (1818-1897), and a younger Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900). What unites them is a shared belief that historiography should highlight rather than obscure the achievements of individuals under the banner of necessary rational progress, a general ridicule of any historical process which brings about providential ends in the face of overwhelming global suffering, an anti-statist political stance, and a disavowal of progress as coextensive with the expansion of social welfare, intellectualism, and utility. Past epochs were not merely some preparatory ground on the way to the comfortably modern Hegelian or Marxist state, but stand on their own as inherently superior cultures and healthier models of culture life. For Bachofen and Nietzsche, this meant the ancient Greeks, for Burckhardt the aristocrats of the Italian Renaissance. So too ought the remarkable individuals of these eras be seen as fully-willed heroes rather than as Hegelian ‘world-historical individuals’ who appear only when the world process requires a nudge in the direction that providence had already chosen apart from them.

Of the latter group, we may count his disciples both on the left and the right, and prominent theorists of history like Ludwig Feuerbach (1804-1872), David Friedrich Strauss (1808-1874), Eduard von Hartmann (1842-1906), Max Stirner (1806-1856), Georg Lukács (1885-1971), Arnold Toynbee (1889-1975), Herbert Marcuse (1898-1979), Alexandre Kojève (1902-1968), and Theodor Adorno (1903-1969). Most recently the general outline of Hegel’s philosophy of history has been adopted in Francis Fukuyama's (1952—) controversial The End of History (1992).

But without question the most important philosophical engagement with Hegel’s historiography is that of Karl Marx (1818-1883), whose own account of the past is often considered a sort of ‘upside-down’ version of Hegel’s Weltprozess. Even while Marx maintains Hegel’s belief in dialectical progress and historical inevitability, he supplants his speculative method with a historical materialism that views the transitions of epochs in terms of the relationship between production and ownership. Marx’s account of the past has obviously had pervasive political and economic influences; but his philosophy of history has also won many modern and contemporary adherents among a wide number of practicing historians, who regard material conditions as opposed to motivational conditions, as sufficient for historical explanation.

5. 19th Century Scientific Historiography



Perhaps the most common complaint against the Hegelians was that their speculative systems overlooked the empirical facts of history. This explains to some degree the partition, new to the 19th century, between philosophers of history and practicing historians, who were themselves often quite reflective on the philosophical issues of their discipline. Friedrich August Wolf (1759-1824), the first to enter the ranks of the German academy as a classical philologist, was exemplary in this respect. Though more focused on religious and romantic historians, Wolf rejected teleological systems generally by his demand that interpretation be grounded in the combination of a comprehensive sense for the contextual whole of a particular epoch and rigorous attention to the details of textual evidence. Wolf’s 1795 Prolegomena zu Homer is a landmark in source criticism and the first modern attempt to treat history as a genuine science.

While the Romantic historians tried to coopt the intuitive and holistic aspects of Wolf, the influence of his methodological rigor was shared by two rival schools of thought about the possibility of knowledge in antiquity: the Sprachphilologen and the Sachphilologen. J.G.J. Hermann (1772-1848), led the Sprachphilologen in Leipzig along with his followers Karl Lachmann (1793-1851) and Moritz Haupt (1808-1874). For them, knowledge of antiquity concerns principally its verifiability conditions. Since any claim about what Plato, Euripides, or Caesar ‘meant’ requires an evidenced demonstration of their actual words, the philologist’s task should be concerned principally with affixing an as-perfect-as-possible edition of their text. In the 21st century, the legacy of Sprachphilologie can be seen in the tradition of a ‘critical edition’ of an author’s work. The Sachphilologen accepted the demand for critical rigor, but rejected that our knowledge of antiquity should be restricted to written texts. August Boeckh (1785-1867), F.G. Welcker (1784-1868), and Karl Otfried Müller (1797-1840) took seriously the critical methods of Wolf, but cast a wider net in order to incorporate the artifacts, art, and culture. If rigorous proof was sacrificed thereby, then it was repaid by a more comprehensive sense of the genuine life of antiquity. Although sometimes underappreciated by historians of historiography, this debate gave rise to two sets of pervasively influential fields: Sprachphilologie’s demand for rigorous evidence was a forerunner of ‘scientific’ historiography in the mid-19th and 20th centuries; Sachphilologie’s holism laid the groundwork for serious work in archeology, anthropology, numismatics, epigraphy, and a number of other historical disciplines.

What Wolf did for philology, Leopold von Ranke (1795-18860) did for historiography generally. Although arguably exaggerated, his famous claim that historians should not interpret the past subjectively but re-present it wie es eingentlich gewesen ist, or ‘as it really was’, became the rallying cry for practicing historians to reject both the Hegelian system building and the Romantic narratives. And where Wolf sought the scientific character of history in the demonstrability of its evidence, Ranke and propagators such as Heinrich von Sybel (1817-1895) sought it in the disinterested character of its researchers. The historian should be like a clear mirror of the past, absent the biases, political aims, and religious zealotry that distort the image of the real and genuine past. In opposition to the Hegelian and Marxist ranking of ages according to some a priori criterion, Ranke sided with Herder in believing ‘every age is next to God’. To prevent prejudice and hasty generalizations, the historian must not settle for hearsay, but work intensively with official documents and archival records.

In the 20th century, however, and by figures as diverse as E.H. Carr (1892-1982) and Walter Benjamin (1892-1940), Ranke’s hope for empirical objectivity had been characterized as naïvely realist or else as an ironic example of how Western, Christian, economically privileged, and male perspectives masquerade as objectivity. The French Annales School, led by Fernand Braudel (1902-1985), sought to meet these challenges while restoring the Rankean vision of objective historiography.

The mid-1800’s saw another group of historical theorists emerge who were concerned principally to show that the scientific character of historiography concerned its use of the same logic of explanation utilized by the natural scientists. Auguste Comte (1798-1857), founder of positivism, considered history to be a sort of ‘social physics’, which limited explanation to relations among observable phenomena. Any claims to apprehend the ‘real essences’ behind the empirical data was prohibited as a foray into speculative metaphysics. Through empirical inquiry alone we can discover the natural laws that govern historical change. Henry Thomas Buckle’s (1821-1862) History of Civilization in England (1857) made clear that these laws could neither be divined philosophically nor with theological suppositions about divine providence, but could be described statistically in keeping with the empirical methods of the natural sciences.

The most comprehensive advance in the logic of historical inquiry came at this time from John Stuart Mill (1806-1873). Even while he rejected Jeremy Bentham’s (1748-1832) overly reductive hypothesis that all humans are guided simply by pleasure and pain, he maintained the possibility of discovering behavioral laws that would allow us to deduce the meaning of particular actions and predict the future with at least some degree of certainty:

[T]he uniformities of co-existence obtaining among phenomena which are effects of causes, must (as we have so often observed) be corollaries from the laws of causation by which these phenomena are really determined. […] The fundamental problem, therefore, of the social science, is to find the laws according to which any state of society produces the states which succeeds it and takes its place. (Mill 1843, 631)

Despite constraining their explanations to the empirical, many positivists held the belief that history was progressing as a necessary lawful order in terms of both its moral and intellectual development. Comte’s “law of three stages,” for example, held that the human mind and by extension the cultural institutions that result from it follow a strict progression from a ‘theological’ view of things, to the ‘metaphysical’, and finally to the ‘scientific’. Critics have charged that Comte is in this way little better than Hegel in positing an overarching structure to events and a certain zealotry about human progress. Nevertheless, Comte’s insistence that empirical laws are deducible from and predictive of human behavior has had decisive influence in the development of sociology and social psychology, especially in the writing of Émile Durkheim (1858-1917) and Max Weber (1864-1920), as well as upon 20th century explanatory positivism.

6. 19th Century Post-Kantian Historiography


Also in conscious opposition to the Hegelians stood the Post-Kantians Wilhem Dilthey (1833-1911), William Windelband (1848-1915), and Heinrich Rickert (1863-1936). Their shared exhortation – ‘back to Kant!’– involved the recognition, absent in both the practicing historians and in the positivists, that knowledge was necessarily mediated by the pre-given structures of the subject of knowing.

Dilthey’s lifelong and never-finalized project was to provide for the ‘human sciences’ – Geisteswissenschaften – what Kant had for metaphysics: a programmatic schemata of the possible logical forms of inquiry such that the necessarily true could be separated from both the arbitrary and the speculative. This involved his supposition that all expressed historical agency is a manifestation of one of three classes of mental states: judgments, actions, and expressions of experience. To understand the working of history is to understand how this trio – described as an inner Lebenszusammenhang – is exercised in all the empirically observable features of the human world. An advantage over the natural scientist’s explanation of physical objects, this descriptive understanding is aided by the analogies we might draw with the understanding of our own inner experiences. We have an inherent sort of sympathetic awareness of historical events since the agents involved in them are psychologically motivated in ways not wholly dissimilar to ourselves.

Windelband took up Dilthey’s suggestions about the differences between history and other sciences on the question of values to forge his own methodological distinction between erklären and verstehen, explanation and understanding. The biggest difference was not just that history involved values, but that the very means by which we come to our knowledge about the past differs from that by which we explain objects external to us. Science deals in invariable laws, in generalities, and considers its individual objects only insofar as they are instances of their classes. For the historian, however, it is the particular that requires examination: Caesar not as an instance of some general rule about how emperors behave, but as a unique, unrepeatable phenomenon distinct from Alexander, Charlemagne, and Ying Zheng. And from particulars alone general laws cannot be formed. In this way, history is ideographic and  descriptive rather than nomothetic or law-positing, and as such, more concerned to describe and understand than to explain.

Heinrich Rickert accepted Windelband’s methodological distinction as well as Dilthey’s attempt to provide the outlines of a distinctively historical logic. But Rickert stressed, more than they, the psychological dimension of historiography. What an historian held as interesting, or what they choose to present of the practical infinity of possible historical inquiries, was not a matter of reason but a psychology of value. And because historiography was value-driven, any attempt to excise its subjective foundation was not only unwarranted but impossible. These practical interests do not force history to resolve into a merely relativistic narrativity, Rickert thought, since human nature was sufficiently uniform to allow for inter-subjectively compelling accounts even if there is never proof in the positivist sense.

The direct influence of post-Kantian philosophy of history is not as pronounced as the teleological or scientific. But the notion that history is a unique sort of inquiry with its own methodology, logic of explanation, and standards of adjudication has been echoed in various ways by figures from Benedetto Croce (1866-1952) and Georg Simmel (1858-1918), to R. G. Collingwood (1889-1943) and Michael Oakeshott (1901-1990); so too has Dilthey’s search for the cognitive and psychological conditions for historical inquiry been taken up by Ernst Cassirer (1874-1945) and by the Frankfurt School of Critical Theory. The hermeneutics of Hans-Georg Gadamer (1900-2002) are in some respects a critical engagement with the Post-Kantian attempt to recover the past as it was apart from the ‘historically conditioned consciousness’ (wirkungsgeschichtliches Bewußtsein) that predetermines our approach to particular texts and, ultimately, the past as a whole.

7. 20th Century Continental

As diverse as continental philosophy has been, it would not be an unwarranted generalization to say that all thinkers and schools have in one way or another been focused on history. And they have mostly been so in terms of two distinct conceptual foci: historicity and narrativity.

It was Nietzsche’s On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life (1874) that first called into question not just how we could obtain knowledge of the past, but whether and to what extent our attempt to know the past is itself a life-enhancing or life-enervating activity. As human beings, we are unique in the animal world insofar as we are constantly burdened with our pasts as well as our futures, unable to forget those incidents which it would be otherwise preferable to bury on the one hand, and unable to ignore what must become of us on the other. History is not just something we study objectively, but an experience through which we must live and by which we seemingly without conscious control burden ourselves for a variety of psychological reasons.

Martin Heidegger’s (1889-1976) Being and Time (1927) attempts to give a comprehensive analysis to this experience. His overarching project is to answer the question ‘what is Being?’ But in doing so, he recognizes that the truth about Being, that is, our openness to the question of Being, has been gradually covered over in the history of philosophy. From the Presocratics, when the question of the meaning of being was at its most open, to the nihilistic academic age of the 20th century, philosophical history becomes a history of the meaning of Being. The end of philosophy, wherein the specialized sciences have entirely preoccupied themselves with particular beings while summarily ignoring Being itself, beckons a new and intrinsically historical engagement. Accordingly, Heidegger’s own historiography of philosophy is a working-back from this modern dead-end in the hopes of reopening the question of Being itself.

Heidegger’s historiography is, however, more than just an academic recitation of what various other philosophers have said. Human beings, what Heidegger famously terms Dasein, are characterized above all by their ‘being there’ in the world, their ‘thrown-ness’ in existence, which entails as it did for Nietzsche their relation to Being itself in terms of both their pasts and their existential march toward the common future horizon: death. The self as Dasein is constantly engaged in the project of coming out of its past and moving into its future as the space of possibilities in which alone it can act. As such an inextricable part of the human person is its historical facticity.

The existential dimension of Heidegger’s conception of historicity had a profound influence on figures like Martin Buber (1878-1965), Karl Jaspers (1883-1969), Hannah Arendt (1906-1975), Emmanuel Levinas (1906-1995), Jan Patočka (1907-1977), and Paul Ricouer (1913-2005). Jean Paul Sartre (1905-1980), in particular, focused on the existential aspects of the past, which he conceives in terms of a blend of the Marxist material conditions for human action and a quasi psycho-analytic unfolding of the phenomenological self. Man is an historical praxis, for Sartre, a continual project that is both being produced by its past and producing its future in a way that will determine that future person’s possibilities and limits. Sartre’s well-known conception of authenticity is intrinsically historical insofar as it involves the recognition of our personal freedom in the context of the material conditions history imposes upon us. Albeit in less existential terms, the Frankfurt School also founded their view of the subject and of the world in a combination of Marxist materialist historiography and psycho-analysis.


In the latter decades of the 20th century, continental philosophy of history turned its attention to epistemological questions about historical narrative. Again Nietzsche’s reflections on history are a crucial influence, especially his contention that truth is no straightforward or objective correspondence between the world and the proposition but a historically contingent outcome of the continuous struggle between the interests of interpreters. As such, philosophy must concern itself with an historical investigation of how these truth practices function within and against the backdrop of their historical facticities.

Michel Foucault (1926-1984) characterized his own project as the historical investigation of the means of truth production. His earlier work is characterized by what he calls ‘archeology’. His History of Madness (1961) begins a series of works that denies a single fixed meaning for phenomena, but undertakes to show how meaning transmogrifies over time through a series of cultural practices. In The Order of Things (1966), archeology is characterized as a description of the transitions between cultural discourses in a way that highlights their structural and contextual meaning while undermining any substantive notion of the author of those discourses. Foucault’s later work, though he never repudiates his archeological method, is characterized as a ‘genealogy’. The effort, again roughly Nietzschean, is to understand the past in terms of the present, to show that the institutions we find today are neither the result of teleological providence nor an instantiation of rational decision making, but emerge from a power play of discourses carried over from the past. This does not mean that history should study the ‘origins’ of those practices; on the contrary it denies the notion of origin as an illegitimate abstraction from what is a continuous interaction of discourses. History should instead concern itself with those moments when the contingencies of the past emerge or descend out of the conflict of its discourses, with how the past reveals a series of disparities rather than progressive steps.

The conception of history as a play of power-seeking discursive practices was reflected back upon the practices of the historian. A row of postmodern philosophers such as Roland Barthes (1915-1980), Paul de Man (1919-1983), Jean-François Lyotard (1924-1988), Gilles Deleuze (1925-1995), Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe (1940-2007), and Jacques Derrida (1930-2004) came to view not just the events of history but also the writing of history to be necessarily colored by power-based subjectivity. This power play crystallizes in the meta-narrative structures grafted upon the world by the philosophers of history. Indeed, Lyotard’s The Postmodern Condition (1979) characterizes the entire postmodern project as “incredulity toward meta-narratives” (Lyotard 1984, xxiv). With respect to philosophy of history, this entails rejecting both the grand Hegelian ‘master discourse’ about progress and also the Enlightenment categories of generalization from which moral lessons are supposed to be derivable. Rather than a dialectical logic that would seek unity among past events, the postmodern condition drives us to see the disjointedness, dissimilarity, and diversity of events and people.

Lyotard’s rejection of traditional unities leads a contemporary postmodernist like Jean-Luc Nancy (1940-) to refocus history on smaller-scale and self-enclosed ‘immanent’ communities like brotherhoods or families rather than on society writ-large. Required for that is a new way of writing history that embraces a multiplicity of perspectives and standards of judgment, and, by extension, a willingness to embrace the plurality of moral and political lessons that can be drawn absent conviction in a single correct narrative. Postmodern theory was influential, for but one example, in the post-colonialism of Edward Said’s (1935-2003) Orientalism (1978), which became prominent for its attempt to open a discursive space for competing non-dominant narratives by the so-called ‘sub-altern’ other. Standpoint narratives, exercises in ‘cultural memory’, and oral history have lately won increasing popularity.

8. 20th Century Anglophone

Like analytic philosophy generally, analytic philosophy of history is partly characterized by its Anglophone heritage and partly by a propensity to treat individual problems rather than offering comprehensive interpretations of reality. The major difference between analytic and continental philosophy of history concerns the former’s almost exclusive focus on epistemological issues of historiography and a general indifference toward questions of historicity.

Anglophone philosophy of history is also marked by its conscious self-distancing from the teleological systems of the Hegelians. There were essentially two reasons for this, one political and one epistemological, brought to eloquent expression in Karl Popper’s (1902-1994) The Open Society and Its Enemies (1945) and The Poverty of Historicism (1957). Concerning the former, Popper charged that the ideological impetus for the totalitarian regimes of the previous hundred years was their shared belief in a national or religious destiny that was both guaranteed and justified by a grand historical process. Whether Bismarck, Communism, Fascism, or Nazism, all were confident that history was inexorably marching toward a global regime that would guarantee their way of life and justify the actions taken in their name. The Anglophone tradition was inspired to deny the grand teleological narrative partly as a political aversion to this way of thinking. Epistemologically, Popper’s ‘falsifiability’ criterion of positive knowledge also targeted the teleological systems of the 19th century. Largely accepting Bertrand Russell’s (1872-1970) natural ontology, he argued that the teleologists began from non-falsifiable assumptions about metaphysical processes, which ignored the empirical facts of the past for the sake of positing what they thought the past must have been. The focus of philosophy of history in the Anglophone world after Popper turned away from attempts to provide grand narratives in order to deal with specific meta-historical problems.

One problem, carried over from the 19th century scientific philosophers of history, was the logic of historical explanation. Similar to their positivist counterparts, the earlier analytics held explanations to be justified insofar as they were able to render historical events predictable by means of deducing their particulars under a general law. The most well-known expression comes from C.G. Hempel (1905-1997). “Historical explanation, too, aims at showing that the event in question was not a ‘matter of chance’, but was to be expected in view of certain antecedent or simultaneous conditions. The expectation referred to is not prophecy or divination, but rational scientific anticipation which rests on the assumption of general laws” (Hempel 1959, 348f). The logic itself is straightforward: “The explanation of the occurrence of an event of some specific kind E at a certain place and time consists, as it is usually expressed, in indicating the causes or determining factors of E” (Ibid, 345). In this respect, the logic of historical explanation is no different from the logic of scientific explanation. And while they may be more difficult to locate, once the laws of historical change have been discovered by psychology, anthropology, economics, or sociology, the predictive force of historiography should theoretically rival that of the natural sciences.

Hempel’s confidence came under attack from those like Popper who thought that history could not offer absolute regularities and maintained that predictions were never inviolable but at best probable ‘trends’. Attack also came from R.G. Collingwood, who denied the existence of covering laws in history and accordingly the applicability of scientific explanatory mechanisms. For him, as well as for Michael Oakeshott, history is a study of the uniqueness of the past and not its generalities, and always for the sake of understanding rather than proving or predicting. In agreement with Aristotle, Oakeshott believes, “the moment historical facts are regarded as instances of general laws, history is dismissed” (Oakeshott 1933, 154). It is the particular, especially the particular person, that history studies, and as such the attempt to predict their behavior nomothetically is not only impossible but misunderstands the very reason for historical inquiry in the first place.

Contrary to Aristotle, the unscientific character of history for Collingwood and Oakeshott renders it no less-worthy a course of study. Indeed, following the Post-Kantian 19th century philosophers of history and ultimately Vico, they thought the past proves itself more intelligible precisely because the objects under investigation can be understood from the ‘inside’ rather than explained from a standpoint outside the object. The proper task of history, Collingwood thought, was not to address mere general naturalistic events but the rationality of specific actions. A mass migration can be studied by the sociologist, the geographer, or the volcanologist from the ‘outside’ as a natural event. What marks the historian, by contrast, is her interest in the actions of the migrating individuals in terms of their intentions and decisions. While this may not be recorded in any palpable evidence, Collingwood was consistent with Herder in thinking that the historian must attempt to ‘get inside the head’ of the agents being investigated under the presumption that they typically make similarly reasonable choices as she would in the same situation. Collingwood’s advocation of a sort of empathic projection into the mind of past agents has been criticized as armchair psychologism. It would be difficult to deny, however, that many working historians adopt Collingwood’s intuitivism rather than the Hempelian nomothetic deduction.

In the latter half of the 20th century, a number of explanatory theories were proposed which walk a middle line between the nomothetic and idealist proposals. W.H. Walsh (1913-1986) returned to William Whewell’s (1794-1866) conception of ‘colligation’ type explanations as a way of making the past intelligible. Here the effort is neither to demonstrate nor to predict, but to bring together various relevant events around a central unifying concept in order to make clear their interconnections:

What we want from historians is […] an account which brings out their connections and bearing on one another. And when historians are in a position to give such an account it may be said that they have succeeded in ‘making sense of’ or ‘understanding’ their material. (Walsh 1957, 299)

In this way, Walsh’s meta-theory sides neither with the ‘scientific’ philosophers of history of either the Comteian or Hempelian variety nor with the British idealists, but maintains that the explanatory force of historiography rests in its narrativity. Just as the pedagogical value of a narrative is not reducible to what it can demonstrate, so the value of history rests in its ability to make sense of various features of the lives and times of others.

William Dray (1921-2009), too, argued that historical explanation does not require the sufficient conditions for why something happened, but only the necessary conditions for describing how what did happen could possibly have happened. For example, if an historian accounts for the assassination of a king in terms of his unpopular policies and dishonest court, then this explains ‘how’ his assassination could possibly have occurred without relying on a Hempelian deduction from some suppositional law that claims all kings with unpopular policies and dishonest courts will necessarily be assassinated.

A second problem addressed by 20th century Anglophone philosophers of history concerned the nature and possibility of objectivity. While all would agree with Ranke that historiography should endeavor to expunge overt biases and prejudices, the question remains to what extent this could or even should be done. Carl Becker (1873-1945) was perhaps the first Anglophone thinker to take up Croce’s claim that all history is ‘contemporary’ in the sense of being written necessarily from the perspective of present-day interests. Along these lines Charles Beard (1874-1948) had a series of arguments against the Rankean ideal of objectivity. Historiography cannot observe its subject matter since by definition what is in the past is no longer in the present; evidence is always fragmentary and never controllable the way a scientific experiment can control its variables; historians impose structures that the events themselves do not have; and their accounts are selective in ways that betray the historians’ own interests. Nevertheless, Beard would not come to endorse the sort of relativistic narrativism of his post-modern continental counterparts.

It certainly seems true to say that historians select – insofar as a map is itself not the road – and that their selection is a matter of what they personally esteem worth discussing, whether on the level of their general topic or in terms of which causes they consider relevant within an explanation. But selectivity of itself does not imply prejudice; and a careful reader is more often than not able to distinguish overtly prejudiced accounts from one whose selections are balanced and fair. Moreover, the fact that they are selective would not serve as a prima facie principle of discernment between historians and scientists, since the latter are every bit as selective in the topics under their purview. Even if science and historiography choose their inquiries as a matter of personal interest, both operate under norms to be impartial, to use only reputable evidence, and to present ‘the whole truth’, even should it call into question their hypotheses.

Isaiah Berlin (1909-1997) considered the problem of historiographical objectivity from the perspective of the objects written about rather than exclusively the writer. While the scientist has little emotional commitment to the chemicals or atoms under examination, historians often have strong feelings about the moral consequences of their subjects. The choice between historical designations like ‘terrorist’ and ‘freedom fighter’, ‘sedition’ and ‘revolution’, or ‘ruler’ and ‘tyrant’ are normatively connotative in a way that scientific descriptions can easily avoid. Yet to write about the holocaust or slavery in a purposefully detached way misses the intensely personal character of these events and thus fails to communicate their genuine meaning, even if doing so detracts from their status as objective records in a way scientific history would disallow. Historians justifiably maintain “that minimal degree of moral or psychological evaluation which is necessarily involved in viewing human beings as creatures with purposes and motives (and not merely as causal factors in the procession of events)” (Berlin 1954, 52f). What precisely that minimal degree is, however, and how a working historian can navigate moral gray areas without falling back into inherited biases, remains difficult to account for.

Beard’s contentions about the possibility of objectivity led some philosophers of history to wonder whether the past was something that existed only in the mind of the historian, if, in other words, the past was constructed rather than discovered. For a constructivist like Leon Goldstein (1927-2002), this does not imply an ontological anti-realism wherein none but perceptible objects are considered real. For Goldstein, it would be senseless for historians to doubt that the world they study ever existed; constructivists are equally constrained by evidence as their objectivist counterparts. And for both the evidence with which the historian works concerns a genuinely past state of affairs outside their own minds. The meaningfulness of that evidence –what the evidence is evidence ‘of’— is, for the constructivist, only imbued by the mind of the historian who considers it. A Roman coin is a piece of evidence dating from a certain era and can provide evidence ‘of’ that era’s monetary policy and trade. But that coin is also evidence ‘of’ the natural environment of every single moment it was buried in the ground thereafter, providing evidence, if one were so interested, in the corrosive effects of the acidity levels near the banks of the Tiber. What that evidence is evidence ‘of’ depends upon the mind of the historian who utilizes it to construct a meaningful account in accord with her interests. Were the viewer of the coin wholly oblivious to either Rome or the natural environment, the coin would not cease to exist, of course; but it would cease to evidence either of these topics. In that sense at least, even non-postmodern Anglophone philosophers of history admit the necessarily interpretive and constructive aspects of historiography. Peter Novick (1934-) and Richard Evans (1947-) have recently taken up the limits of constructivism on behalf of professional historians.

How causes function within historical accounts was the third major question for 20th century Anglophone philosophers of history. Historians, like most people, tend to treat causal terms like ‘influenced’, ‘generated’, ‘brought about’, ‘led to’, ‘resulted in’, among others, as unproblematic diagnostics to explain how events come about. For philosophers generally and for philosophers of history specifically, causation presents a multifaceted set of problems. According to the positivist theory of explanation, an adequate causal account explicates the sum total of necessary and sufficient conditions for an event to take place. This ideal bar is acknowledged as having been set too high for practicing historians, since there is perhaps a near infinity of necessary causes for any historical event. That the assassination of Archduke Ferdinand was a cause of the First World War is clear; but necessary, too, was an indescribably myriad set of other economic, social, political, geographical, and even personal factors that led to such a wide-reaching and complex phenomenon to take place precisely as it did: had Gavrilo Princip not associated with the Young Bosnian movement, had gravity failed that day causing bullets to float harmlessly upward, had the Austro-Hungarian alliance not held the southern Slavic provinces, had Franz Ferdinand decided to stay at home on June 28th, 1914 – were any of these conditions actual, the course of history would have been altered. Thus, their contraries were necessary for having produced the exact outcome that obtained. Because it would be quite impossible, if not ridiculous, for an historian to attempt to record all of these, he must admit that his explanation fails to satisfy the positivist criterion and therefore remains only a partial one –an ‘explanation sketch’ in Hempel’s phrasing.

R.G. Collingwood was again influential in overturning the positivist view by distinguishing causes and motives. Physical causes such as properly working guns or the presence of gravity are necessary for assassination in a strictly physical sense. But no historian would bother mentioning them. Only motives, the reasons agents have for conducting their actions, are typically referenced: what motives Princip had for firing and what motives the leaders of Germany, France, and Russia had to mobilize their armies. A proper explanation, for Collingwood, involves making clear the reasons why the key actors participated in an event as they did.

While Collingwood’s theory is intuitively suggestive and matches rather well the character of most historical accounts, some philosophers have noted shortcomings. One is that Collingwood presumes a freedom of choice that relies upon an outmoded notion of cognitive agency. The same reasons that are purported to have been causally efficacious are often enough retrospective justifications supplied by agents who in reality acted without conscious deliberation. Second, even if freedom of choice is presumed, transparency about an agent’s motives cannot be. Collingwood often appeals to a particular motive as what a reasonable being would elect to do in a certain situation. Yet those standards of reasonability more often betray the historian’s own projection than anything psychologically demonstrable. The third is that, as historians themselves often note, many actions do not result from the motives of their agents but from the confluence of several motives whose outcome is unpredictable. The motive for Princip’s assassination was not to start a world-wide conflict anymore than Robert E. Lee’s capture of John Brown at Harper’s Ferry was intended to begin the American Civil War. Both actions were nevertheless crucial causes of consequences whose main actors could not have foreseen them, much less have willed.

Following the conception of causation in legal theory promulgated by H.L.A. Hart (1907-1992) and Tony Honoré (1921-), some philosophers consider a proper causal ascription in history to amount to a description of both intention and abnormality. Just as in legal cases, where conditions in history are normalized the abnormal or untypical decision or event is assigned responsibility for what results. In our example of the causes of WWI, the long history of constant political bickering between the great powers was of course part of the story, but the assassination of the Archduke is assigned responsibility since it stands so untypically out of its context.

The shift in thinking about historical causes as metaphysical entities which bring about change themselves to a set of epistemological grounds that explain why change occurred has led some recent philosophers to adopt David Lewis’s (1941-2001) notion of counterfactuals. “We think of a cause as something that makes a difference, and the difference it makes must be a difference from what would have happened without it. Had it been absent, its effects ─ some of them, at least, and usually all ─ would have been absent as well” (Lewis 1986, 161). Counterfactuals had long been employed by historians in the commonsense way that ascribes sufficient cause to that object or event whose consequence could not have happened without it, in the form ‘were it not for A, B never would have occurred’ or ‘No B without A’. To adapt our previous example, one might justifiably think the assassination of Archduke Ferdinand was the sufficient cause of WWI if and only if one thinks WWI would not have happened in its absence. Yet whereas counterfactuals are easily enough tested in science by running multiple experiments that control for the variable in question, the unrepeatability of historical events renders traditional counterfactual statements little more than interesting speculations. To ask how Rome would have developed had Caesar never crossed the Rubicon may be a fascinating thought experiment, but nothing remotely verifiable since a contrary-to-fact conditional is by definition unable to be tested given only one course of facts. Lewis would revise this traditional notion of counterfactuals to include the semantics of maximally similar possible worlds, wherein two worlds are supposed entirely identical save for one alteration which brings about the event in question. Under the previous description of the necessary conditions for WWI, Franz Ferdinand’s assassination was considered a necessary condition. Lewis’s revised version instead presents two maximally similar worlds, world ‘A’ where the assassination takes place and world ‘B’ which is identical in all respects except that the assassination does not take place. Under this model, it is at best debatable whether war would not have broken out anyway in world ‘B’ given the highly charged political atmosphere in Europe at that time. And as such we are invited to question whether assigning the assassination a causal role is justified.

9. Contemporary

Characterized by its criticism of the 20th century Anglophone attempts to epistemologically ground historical explanation, objectivity, and causation as universal functions of logic, the Postmodern legacy in philosophy of history has been taken up by three contemporary theorists in particular: Hayden White (1928-), Frank Ankersmit (1945-), and Keith Jenkins (1943-). Each maintains that the analysis of these epistemological issues wrongly circumvents questions about interpretation and meaning, and each considers the search for once-and-for-all demonstrations an attempt to avoid the relativistic character of historical truth. Hayden White inaugurated this ‘linguistic turn’ in historiography with his Meta-History: The Historical Imagination in Nineteenth-Century Europe (1979). By focusing on the structures and strategies of historical accounts, White came to see historiography and literature as fundamentally the same endeavor. Historians, like fiction writers, wrote according to a four-fold logic of emplotment, according to whether they saw their subject matter as a romance, tragedy comedy, or satire. This aim stems from their political ideology – anarchist, radical, conservative, or liberal respectively – and is worked out by means of a dominant rhetorical trope – metaphor, metonymy, synecdoche, or irony respectively. Representative philosophers – Nietzsche, Marx, Hegel, and Croce – and representative historians – Michelet, Tocqueville, Ranke, and Burckhardt – are themselves tied to these modes of emplotment. While White’s architectonic has come under criticism as being both overly reductive in its structure and a warrant for relativism, other theorists have taken up his banner.

Among these, Frank Ankersmit endorses the general outline of White’s narrativism, while stressing the constructivist aspect of our experience of the past. There is no ‘ideal narratio’ for Ankersmit, because ultimately there is no ontological structure onto which the single ‘correct’ narration can be correspondentially grafted. Alongside Gianni Vattimo (1936-), Sande Cohen (1946-), and Alan Munslow (1947-), Keith Jenkins takes White’s anti-realism in a decidedly deconstructionist fashion. Jenkins exhorts an end to historiography as customarily practiced. Since historians can never be wholly objective, and since historical judgment cannot pretend to a correspondential standard of truth, all that remains of history are the congealed power structures of a privileged class. In a statement that summarizes much of contemporary historical theory, Jenkins concludes the following:

[Historiography] now appears as a self-referential, problematic expression of ‘interests’, an ideologically-interpretive discourse without any ‘real’ access to the past as such; unable to engage in any dialogue with ‘reality’. In fact, ‘history’ now appears to be just one more ‘expression’ in a world of postmodern expressions: which of course is what it is. (Jenkins 1995, 9)

Although 21st century philosophy of history has widened the gap between practicing historians and theorists of history, and although it has lost some of the popularity it enjoyed from the early-19th to mid-20th century, it will remain a vigorous field of inquiry so long as the past itself continues to serve as a source of philosophical curiosity.

10. References and Further Reading

a. Classical Works in English Translation

  • Herodotus, Histories (c.450BCE-c.420BCE), translated by J. Marincola (London, 1996).
  • Thucydides, History of the Peloponnesian War (431BCE), translated by R. Warner (London, 1972).
  • Augustine of Hippo, The City of God (c. 422), translated by R.W. Dyson (Cambridge, 1998).
  • J. B. Bossuet, A Universal History (1681) (London, 1778).
  • G. Vico, The New Science (1725), translated by Bergin & Fisch (Ithaca, NY, 1948).
  • C. Montesquieu, The Spirit of the Laws (1748), translated by T. Nugent (London, 1902).
  • F.M.A. Voltaire, “Historiography” and “History” in his Philosophical Dictionary (1764), volume IV, translated by J. Morley (London, 1824).
  • J.G. Herder, Outlines of a Philosophy of the History of Man (1781), translated by T. Churchill (London, 1803).
  • I. Kant, “The Idea of a Universal Cosmo-Political History” (1784), translated by W. Hastie, in Eternal Peace and Other International Essays (Boston, 1914).
  • E. Burke, Reflections on the Revolution in France (1790) (London: 1940).
  • A.N. Condorcet, Sketch for a Historical Picture of the Progress of the Human Mind (1795), translated by J. Barraclough (London, 1955).
  • G.W.F. Hegel, Introduction to the Philosophy of History (1837), translated by L. Rauch (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1988).
  • T. Carlyle, On Heroes, Hero-Worship, and the Heroic in History (1841), in The Works of Thomas Carlyle, edited by H. Traill (New York, 1896-1901).
  • J.S. Mill, A System of Logic (1843), in Collected Works, edited by J. Robson (Toronto, 1963-91).
  • A. Comte, The Positive Philosophy of Auguste Comte (1853), 2 vols., translated by H. Martineau (London, 1893).
  • H.T. Buckle, History of Civilization in England (1864), 3 vols. (London, 1899).
  • J. Burckhardt, Judgments on History and Historians (compiled from 1860’s-1880’s), translated by H. Zohn (Boston, 1958).
  • F. Nietzsche, On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life (1874), translated by P. Preuss (Indianapolis, 1980).
  • W. Dilthey, Introduction to the Human Sciences (1883), translated by Makkreel & Rodi (Princeton, 1991).
  • F. Nietzsche,  On the Genealogy of Morals (1887), translated by Clark & Swensen (Indianapolis, 1998).
  • W. Windelband, An Introduction to Philosophy (1895), translated by J. McCabe (London, 1921).
  • H. Rickert, Science and History: A Critique of Positivist Epistemology (1899), translated by G. Reisman (New York, 1962).
  • B. Croce, Theory and History of Historiography (1916), translated by D. Ainslie (London, 1921).
  • O. Spengler, The Decline of the West (1923), 2 vols., translated by C.F. Atkinson (New York, 1947).
  • M. Oakeshott, Experience and Its Modes (Cambridge, 1933).
  • A. Toynbee, A Study of History, 10 vols. (Oxford, 1934-54).
  • B. Croce, History as the Story of Liberty (1938), translated by S. Sprigge (London, 1941).
  • M. Mandelbaum, The Problem of Historical Knowledge (New York, 1938).
  • C. Hempel, “The Function of General Laws in History (1942),” in Theories of History, edited by P. Gardiner (New York/London, 1959), 344-356.
  • K. Popper, The Open Society and Its Enemies, 2 vols. (1945).
  • R. Collingwood, The Idea of History (Oxford, 1946).
  • K. Popper, The Poverty of Historicism (London, 1957).
  • B. Russell, Understanding History (New York, 1957).
  • K. Popper, The Logic of Scientific Discovery (New York, 1959).
  • H.G. Gadamer, Truth and Method (1960), translated by Weinsheimer & Marshall (New York, 1989).
  • E.H. Carr, What is History? (New York, 1961).
  • A. Danto, Analytical Philosophy of History (Cambridge, 1965).
  • C. Hempel, Aspects of Scientific Explanation (New York, 1965).
  • W. Dray, Philosophical Analysis and History (New York, 1966).
  • G. Elton, The Practice of History (London, 1969).
  • M. Foucault, The Archeology of Knowledge (New York, 1972).
  • H. White, Meta-history: The Historical Imagination in Nineteenth-century Europe (Baltimore, 1973).
  • E. Said, Orientalism (New York, 1978).
  • J.F. Lyotard, The Postmodern Condition: A Report on Knowledge (1979), translated by Bennington & Massumi (Minneapolis, 1984).
  • P. Ricoeur, Time and Narrative (1983-5), 3 vols., translated by McLaughlin & Pellauer (Chicago, 1984-8)
  • P. Novick, That Noble Dream: The ‘Objectivity Question’ and the American Historical Profession (Cambridge, 1988).
  • K. Jenkins, Re-Thinking History (London, 1991).
  • R. Evans, In Defense of History (London, 1999).
  • F. Ankersmit, Historiographical Representation (Stanford, 2001).

b. Prominent Scholarship and Collections

  • R. Aron, Introduction to the Philosophy of History, translated by G. Irwin (Westport, CT, 1976).
  • C. Bambach, Heidegger, Dilthey, and the Crisis of Historicism (Ithaca, NY, 1995).
  • C. Becker, Everyman his own Historian (New York, 1935).
  • I. Berlin, Historical Inevitability (New York, 1954).
  • I. Berlin, Vico and Herder: Two Studies in the History of Ideas (New York, 1976).
  • M. Bloch, The Historian’s Craft, translated by P. Putnam (New York, 1953).
  • E. Breisach, Historiography: Ancient, Medieval, and Modern (Chicago, 1983).
  • E. Breisach, On the Future of History: The Postmodernist Challenge and its Aftermath (Chicago, 2003).
  • J. Bury, The Idea of Progress (London, 1920).
  • D. Carr, Time, Narrative, and History (Bloomington, IN, 1986).
  • D. Chakrabarty, Provincializing Europe: Postcolonial Thought and Historical Difference (Princeton, NJ, 2000).
  • R. D’Amico, Historicism and Knowledge (New York, 1989).
  • W. Dray, Laws and Explanation in History (London, 1957).
  • W. Dray, Philosophy of History (Englewood Cliffs, NJ, 1964).
  • M. Dummett, Truth and the Past (New York, 2006).
  • E. Fryde, Humanism and Renaissance Historiography (London, 1983).
  • M. Fulbrook, Historical Theory (London, 2002).
  • P. Gardiner, The Nature of Historical Explanation (Oxford, 1952). (ed.) The Philosophy of History (Oxford, 1974).
  • C. Geertz, The Interpretation of Culture (New York, 1973).
  • L. Goldstein, Historical Knowing (Austin, TX, 1976).
  • L. Gossman,Basel in the Age of Burckhardt (Chicago, 2000).
  • L. Gossman, Between History and Literature (Cambridge, MA, 1990).
  • A. Grafton, The Footnote: A Curious History (London, 1997).
  • I. Hacking, Historical Ontology (Cambridge, MA, 1990).
  • E. Hobsbawm, On History (London, 1998).
  • G. Iggers, The German Conception of History (Hanover, NH, 1968).
  • G. Iggers, Historiography in the Twentieth Century (Middleton, CT, 1997).
  • K. Jenkins, On ‘What is History?’ (London, 1995). (ed.), The Postmodern History Reader (London, 1997).
  • H. Kellner, Language and Historical Representation (Madison, WI, 1989).
  • P. Kosso, Knowing the Past (Amherst, NY, 2001).
  • D. La Capra, History and Criticism (Ithaca, NY, 1985).
  • D. La Capra, Rethinking Intellectual History (Ithaca, NY, 1983).
  • K. H. Lembeck (ed.), Geschichtsphilosophie (Freiburg, 2000).
  • D. Lewis, Philosophical Papers: Volume II (Oxford, 1986).
  • K. Löwith, Meaning in History (Chicago, 1948).
  • G. Lukács, History and Class Consciousness: Studies in Marxist Dialectics, translated by R. Livingstone (Cambridge, MA, 1971).
  • K. Mannheim, Ideology and Utopia (London, 1936).
  • K. Marx & F. Engels, Karl Marx: Selected Writings in Sociology and Social Philosophy, edited by Bottomore & Rubel (London, 1956).
  • A. Marwick, The New Nature of History: Knowledge, Evidence, Language (London, 2001).
  • F. Meinecke, Historicism: The Rise of a New Historical Outlook, translated by J. Anderson (London, 1972).
  • L. Mink, Historical Understanding (Ithaca, NY, 1987).
  • A. Momigliano, The Classical Foundations of Modern Historiography (Berkeley, CA, 1990).
  • A. Munslow, The Routledge Companion to Historical Studies (London, 2000).
  • J. Patočka, Heretical Essays in the Philosophy of History, translated by E. Kohák (Chicago, 1996).
  • L. Pompa, Human Nature and Historical Knowledge (Cambridge, 1990).
  • H. Putnam, Reason, Truth, and History (Cambridge, 1981).
  • L.v. Ranke, The Theory and Practice of History, edited by Iggers & Moltke (Indianapolis, 1973).
  • G. Roberts, The History and Narrative Reader (London, 2001).
  • F. Rosenthal, History of Muslim Historiography (Leiden, 2nd Edition, 1968).
  • J. Rüsen, Grundzüge einer Historik (Göttingen, 1986).
  • B. Southgate, Postmodernism in History: Fear or Freedom? (London, 2003).
  • F. Stern (ed.), The Varieties of History: from Voltaire to the Present (London, 1970).
  • A. Tucker, Our Knowledge of the Past: A Philosophy of Historiography (Cambridge, 2004).
  • W. Walsh, An Introduction to Philosophy of History (New York, 1976).
  • W. Walsh, “‘Meaning’ in History,” in Theories of History, edited by P. Gardiner (New York/London, 1957), 296-307.
  • M. White, Foundations of Historical Knowledge (New York, 1965).
  • R. Young, White Mythologies: Writing History and the West (London, 1990).
  • J. Zammito, A Nice Derangement of Epistemes: Post-positivism in the Study of Science from Quine to Latour (Chicago, 2004).


Author Information

Anthony K. Jensen
City University of New York / Lehman College
U. S. A.

Phenomenology and Natural Science

Phenomenology provides an excellent framework for a comprehensive understanding of the natural sciences. It treats inquiry first and foremost as a process of looking and discovering rather than assuming and deducing. In looking and discovering, an object always appears to a someone, either an individual or community; and the ways an object appears and the state of the individual or community to which it appears are correlated.

To use the simplest of examples involving ordinary perception, when I see a cup, I see it only through a single profile. Yet to perceive it as real rather than a hallucination or prop is to apprehend it as having other profiles that will show themselves as I walk around it, pick it up, and so forth. No act of perception – not even a God’s – can grasp all of a thing’s profiles at once. The real is always more than what we can perceive.

Phenomenology of science treats discovery as an instrumentally mediated form of perception. When researchers detect the existence of a new particle or asteroid, it assumes these will appear in other ways in other circumstances – and this can be confirmed or disconfirmed only by looking, in some suitably broad sense. It is obvious to scientists that electrons appear differently when addressed by different instrumentation (for example, wave-particle duality), and therefore that any conceptual grasp of the phenomenon involves instrumental mediation and anticipation. Not only is there no “view from nowhere” on such phenomena, but there is also no position from which we can zoom in on every available profile. There is no one privileged perception and the instrumentally mediated “positions” from which we perceive constantly change.

Phenomenology looks at science from various “focal lengths.” Close up, it looks at laboratory life; at attitudes, practices, and objects in the laboratory. It also pulls back the focus and looks at forms of mediation – how things like instruments, theories, laboratories, and various other practices mediate scientific perception. It can pull the focus back still further and look at how scientific research itself is contextualized, in an environment full of ethical and political motivations and power relations. Phenomenology has also made specific contributions to understanding relativity, quantum mechanics, and evolution.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Historical Overview
  3. Science and Perception
  4. General Implications
    1. The Priority of Meaning over Technique
    2. The Priority of the Practical over the Theoretical
    3. The priority of situation over abstract formalization
  5. Layers of Experience
    1. First Phase: Laboratory Life
    2. Second Phase: Forms of Mediation
    3. Third Phase: Contextualization of Research
  6. Phenomenology and Specific Sciences
    1. Relativity
    2. Quantum Mechanics
    3. Evolution
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Phenomenology provides an excellent starting point, perhaps the only adequate starting point, for a comprehensive understanding of the natural sciences: their existence, practices, methods, products, and cultural niches. The reason is that, for a phenomenologist, inquiry is first and foremost a question of looking and discovering rather than assuming and deducing. In looking and discovering, an object is always given to a someone – be it an individual or community – and the object and its manners of givenness are correlated. In the special terminology of phenomenology, this is the doctrine of intentionality (for example, see Cairns 1999). This doctrine has nothing to do with the distinction between “inner” and “outer” experiences, but is a simple fact of perception. To use the time-honored phenomenological example, even when I see an ordinary object such as a cup, I apprehend it only through a single appearance or profile. Yet for me to perceive it as a real object – rather than a hallucination or prop – I apprehend it as having other profiles that will show themselves as I walk around it, pick it up, and so forth, each profile flowing into the next in an orderly, systematic way. I do more than expect or deduce these profiles; the act of perceiving a cup contains anticipations of other acts in which the same object will be experienced in other ways. That’s what gives my experience of the world its depth and density. Perhaps I will discover that my original perception was misled, and my anticipations were mere assumptions; still, I discover this only through looking and discovering – through sampling other profiles. In science, too, when researchers propose the existence of a new particle or asteroid, such a proposal involves anticipations of that entity appearing in other ways in other circumstances, anticipations that can be confirmed or disconfirmed only by looking, in some suitably broad sense (Crease 1993). In ordinary perception, each appearance and profile (noema) is correlated with a particular position of the one who apprehends it (noesis); a change in either one (the cup turning, the person moving) affects the profile apprehended. This is called the noetic-noematic correlation. In science, the positioning of the observer is technologically mediated; what a particle or cell looks like depends in part on the state of instrumentation that mediates the observation.

Another core doctrine of phenomenology is the lifeworld (Crease 2011). Human beings, that is, engage the world in different ways. For instance, they seek wealth, fame, pleasure, companionship, happiness, or “the good”. They do this as children, adolescents, parents, merchants, athletes, teachers, and administrators. All these ways of being are modifications of a matrix of practical attachments that human beings have to the world that precedes any cognitive understanding. The lifeworld is the technical term phenomenologists have for this matrix. The lifeworld is the soil out of which grow various ways of being, including science. Understanding photosynthesis or quantum field theory, for instance, is only one – and very rare – way that human beings interact with plants or matter, and not the default setting. Humans have to be trained to see the world that way; they have to pay a special kind of attention and pursue a special kind of inquiry. Thus the subject-inquirer (again, whether individual or community) is always bound up with what is being inquired into by practical engagements that precede the inquiry, engagements that can be altered by and in the wake of the inquiry. It is terribly tempting for metaphysicians to “kick away the ladder of lived experience” from scientific ontology as a means to gain some sort of privileged access to the world that bypasses lifeworld experience, but this condemns science to being “empty fictions” (Vallor 2009).

The aim of phenomenology is to unearth invariants in noetic-noematic correlations, to make forms or structures of experience appear that are hidden in ordinary, unreflective life, or the natural attitude. Again, the parallel with scientific methodology is uncanny; scientific inquiry aims to find hidden forms or structures of the world by varying, repeating, or otherwise changing interventions into nature to see what remains the same throughout. Phenomenologists seek invariant structures at several different phases or levels – including that of the investigator, the laboratory, and the lifeworld - and can examine not only each phase or level, but the relation of each to the others. Over the last hundred years, this has generated a vast and diverse body of literature (Ginev 2006; Kockelmans & Kisiel 1970; Chasan 1992; Hardy and Embree 1992; McGuire and Tuchanska 2001; Gutting 2005).

2. Historical Overview

Phenomenology started out, in Husserl’s hands, well-positioned to develop an account of science. After all, Husserl was at the University of Göttingen during the years when David Hilbert, Felix Klein, and Emmy Noether were developing and extending the notion of invariance and group theory. Husserl not only had a deep appreciation for mathematics and natural science, but his approach was allied in many key respects with theirs, for he extended the notion of invariance to perception by viewing the experience of an object as of something that remains the same in the flux of changing sensory conditions produced by changing physical conditions. This may seem far-removed from the domain of mathematics but it is not. Klein's Erlanger program viewed mathematical objects as not representable geometrically all at once but rather in definite and particular ways, depending on the planes on which they were projected; the mathematical object remained the same throughout different projections. In an analogous way, Husserl’s phenomenological program viewed a sensuously apprehended object as not given to an experiencing subject all at once but rather via a series of adumbrations or profiles, one at a time, that depend on the respective positioning of subject and object. The “same” object – even light of a certain wavelength – can look very different to human observers in different conditions. What is different about Husserl’s program, and may make it seem removed from the mathematical context, is that these profiles are not mathematical projections but lifeworld experiences. What remained to be added to the phenomenological approach to create a fuller framework for a natural philosophy of science was a notion of perceptual fulfillment under laboratory conditions, and of the theoretical planning and instrumental mediation leading to the observing of a scientific object. The “same” structure – for example, a cell – will look very different using microscopes of different magnification and quality, and phenomenology easily provides an account for this (Crease 2009).

Despite this promising beginning, many phenomenologists after Husserl turned away from the sciences, sometimes even displaying a certain paternalistic and superior attitude towards them as impoverished forms of revealing. This is unwarranted. Husserl’s objection to rationalistic science in the Crisis of the European Sciences was after all not to science but to the Galilean assumption that the ontology of nature could be provided by mathematics alone, bypassing the lifeworld (Gurwitsch 1966, Heelan 1987). And Heidegger’s objection, in Being and Time, most charitably considered, was not to theoretical knowledge, but to the forgetting of the fact that it is a founded mode in the lifeworld, to be interpreted not merely as an aid to disclosure but as a special and specialized mode of access to the real itself. Others to follow, including Gadamer and  Merleau-Ponty, for various reasons did not pursue the significance of phenomenology for natural science.

Science also lagged behind other areas of phenomenological inquiry for historical reasons. The dramatic success of Einstein’s theory of general relativity, in 1919, brought “a watershed for subsequent philosophy of science" that proved to be detrimental to the prospects of phenomenology for science (Ryckman 2005). Kant’s puzzling and ambiguous doctrine of the schematism – according to which intuitions, which are a product of sensibility, and categories, which are a product of understanding, are synthesized by rules or schemata to produce experience – had nurtured two very different approaches to the philosophy of science. One, taken by logical empiricists, rejected the schematism and treated sensibility and the understanding as independent, and the line between the intuitive and the conceptual as that between experienced physical objects and abstract mathematical frameworks. The empiricists saw these two as linked by rules of coordination that applied the latter to the former. Such coordination – the subjective contribution of mind to knowledge – produced objective knowledge. The other, more phenomenological route was to pursue the insight that experience is possible only thanks to the simultaneous co-working of intuitions and concepts. While some forms and categories are subject to replacement, producing a “relativized a priori” (my conception of things like electrons, cells, and simultaneity may change) such forms and categories make experience possible. Objective knowledge arises not by an arbitrary application of concepts to intuitions – it is not just a decision of consciousness – but is a function of the fulfillment of physical conditions of possible conscious experience; scientists look at photographic plates or information collected by detectors in laboriously prepared conditions that assure them that such information is meaningful and not noise. Husserl’s phenomenological approach to transcendental structures, though, must be contrasted with Kant’s, for while Kant’s transcendental concepts are deduced, Husserl’s are reflectively observed and described. However, following the stunning announcement of the success of general relativity in 1919, which seemed to destroy transcendental assumptions about at least the Euclidean form of space and about absolute time, logical empiricists were quick to claim it vindicated their approach and refuted not only Kant but all transcendental philosophy. "Through Einstein … the Kantian position is untenable," Schlick declared, “and empiricist philosophy has gained one of its most brilliant triumphs.”  But the alleged vanquishing of transcendental philosophy and triumph of logical empiricism’s claims to understand science was due to “rhetoric and successful propaganda” rather than argument (Ryckman 2005). For as other transcendental philosophers such as Ernst Cassirer, and philosophically sophisticated scientists such as Hermann Weyl, realized, in making claims about the forms of possible phenomena general relativity called for what amounted to a revision, rather than a refutation, of Kant’s doctrine; how we may experience spatiality in ordinary life remains unaffected by Einstein’s theory. But the careers of both Cassirer and Weyl took them away from such questions, and nobody else took their place.

3. Science and Perception

One way of exhibiting the deep link between phenomenology and science is to note that phenomenology is concerned with the difference between local effects and global structures in perception. To use the time-honored example of perceiving a cup through a profile again: Grasping it under that particular adumbration or profile is a local effect, though what I intend is a global structure – the phenomenon – with multiple horizons of profiles. Phenomenology aims to exhibit how the phenomenon is constituted in describing these horizons of profiles. But this of course is closely related to the aim of science, which seeks to describe how phenomena (for example, electrons) appear differently in different contexts – and even, in the case of general relativity, incorporates a notion of invariance into the very notion of objectivity itself (Ryckman 2005). An objective state of affairs, that is, is one that has the same description regardless of whether the frame of reference from which it is observed is accelerating or not.

In science, however, perceiving (observing) is mediated by theory and instruments. Thanks to theories, the lawlike behavior of scientific phenomena (for example, how electrons behave in different conditions) is represented or “programmed” and then correlated with instrumental techniques and practices so that a phenomenon appears. The theory (for example, electromagnetism) thus structures both the performance process thanks to which the phenomenon appears, and the phenomenon itself. Read noetically, with respect to production, the theory is something to be performed; read noematically, with respect to the product, it describes the object appearing in performance. A theory does not correspond to a scientific phenomenon; rather, the phenomenon fulfills or does not fulfill the expectations of its observation raised by the theory. Is this an electron beam or not?  To decide that, its behavior has to be evaluated. Theory provides a language that the experimenter can use for describing or recognizing or identifying the profiles. For the theorist, the semantics of the language is mathematical; for the experimenter, the semantics are descriptive and the objects described are not mathematical objects but phenomena – bodily presences in the world. Thus the dual semantics of science (Heelan 1988); a scientific word (such as ‘electron’) can refer to both an abstract term in a theory and to a physical phenomenon in a laboratory. The difference is akin to that between a ‘C’ in a musical score and a ‘C’ heard in a concert hall. Conflating these two usages has confused many a philosopher of science. But our perception of the physical phenomenon in the laboratory has been mediated by the instruments used to produce and measure it (Ihde 1990).

By adding theoretical and experimental mediation to Husserl’s account of what is “constitutive” of perceptual horizons (Husserl 2001, from where the following quotations are taken except where noted), one generates a framework for a phenomenological account of science. To grasp a scientific object, like a perceptual object, as a presence in the world, as “objective,” means, strangely enough, to grasp it as never totally given, but as having an unbounded number of profiles that are not simultaneously grasped. Such an object is embedded in a system of “referential implications” available to us to explore over time. And it is rarely grasped with Cartesian clarity the first time around, but “calls out to us” and “pushes us” towards appearances not simultaneously given. A new property, for example parity violation, is detected in one area of particle physics – but if it shows up here it should also show up there even more intensely and dramatically. Entities, that is, show themselves as having further sides to be explored, and as amenable to better and better instrumentation. Phenomena even as it were call attention to their special features – strangeness in elementary particles, DNA in cells, gamma ray bursters amongst astronomical bodies – and recommends these features to us for further exploration. “There is a constant process of anticipation, of preunderstanding.”  With sufficient apprehension of sampled profiles, “The unfamiliar object is … transformed …into a familiar object.”  This involves development both of an inner horizon of profiles already apprehended, already sampled, and an external of not-yet apprehended profiles. But the object is never fully grasped in its complete presence, horizons remain, and the most one can hope for is for a thing to be given optimally in terms of the interests for which it is approached. And because theory and instruments are always changing, the same object will always be grasped with new profiles. Thus, Husserl’s phenomenological account readily handles the often vexing question in traditional philosophy of science of how “the same” experiment can be “repeated.”  It equally readily handles the even more troublesome puzzle in traditional approaches of how successive theories or practices can refer to the same object. For just as the same object can be apprehended “horizontally” in different instrumental contexts at the same time, it can also be apprehended “vertically” by successively more developed instrumentation. Husserl, for instance, refers to the “open horizon of conceivable improvement to be further pursued” (Husserl Crisis #9a). Newer, more advanced instruments will pick out the same entity (for example, an electron), yield new values for measurements of the same quantities, and open up new domains in which new phenomena will appear amid the ones that now appear on the threshold. Today’s discovery is tomorrow’s background.

The basic account of perception given above has been further elaborated in the context of group theory by Ernst Cassirer in a remarkable article (Cassirer 1944). Cassirer extends the attempts of Helmholtz, Poincaré and others to apply the mathematical concept of group to perception in a way that makes it suitable to the philosophy of science. Group theory may seem far from the perceptual world, Cassirer says. But the perceptual world, like the mathematical world, is structured; it possesses perceptual constancy in a way that cannot be reduced to “a mere mosaic, an aggregate of scattered sensations” but involve a certain kind of invariance. Perception is integrated into a total experience in which keeping track of “dissimilarity rather than similarity” is a hallmark of the same object. The cup is going to look different as the light changes and as I move about it. “As the particular changes its position in the context, it changes its “aspect.”  Thus, Cassirer writes, “the ‘possibility of the object’ depends upon the formation of certain invariants in the flux of sense-impressions, no matter whether these be invariants of perception or of geometrical thought, or of physical theory. The positing of something endowed with objective existence and nature depends on the formation of constants of the kinds mentioned …. The truth is that the search for constancy, the tendency toward certain invariants, constitutes a characteristic feature and immanent function of perception. This function is as much a condition of perception of objective existence as it is a condition of objective knowledge.”  The constitutive factor of objective knowledge, Cassirer concludes, “manifests itself in the possibility of forming invariants.”  Again, one needs to flesh out such an approach with account of fulfillment as mediated both theoretically and practically.

4. General Implications

The above, it will be seen, has three general implications for philosophy of science:

a. The Priority of Meaning over Technique.

In contrast to positivist-inspired and much mainstream philosophy of science, a phenomenological approach does not view science as pieced together at the outset from praxes, techniques, and methods. Praxes, techniques, and methods – as well as data and results – come into being by interpretation. The generation of meaning does not move from part to whole, but via a back-and-forth (hermeneutical) process in which phenomena are projected upon an already-existing framework of meaning, the assumptions of which are at least partially brought into question, and by this action further reviewed and refined within the ongoing process of interpretation. This process is amply illustrated by episode after episode in the history of science. Relativity theory evolved as a response to problems and developments experienced by scientists working within Newtonian theory.

b. The Priority of the Practical over the Theoretical

The framework of meaning mentioned above in terms of which phenomena are interpreted is not comprised merely of tools, texts, and ideas, but involves a culturally and historically determined engagement with the world which is prior to the subject and object separation. On the one hand, this means that the meanings generated by science are not ahistorical forms or natural kinds that have a transcendent origin. On the other hand, it means that these meanings are also not arbitrary or mere artifacts of discourse; science has a “historical space” in which meanings are realized or not realized. Results are right or wrong; theories are adjudicated as true or false. Later, as the historical space changes, the “same” theory (or more fully developed versions thereof) may be confirmed by different results inconsistent with previous confirmations of the earlier version. What a “cell” is may look very different depending on the techniques and instruments used to apprehend it, but what is happening is not a wholesale replacement of one picture or theory by another, but expanding and evolving knowledge (Crease 2009).

c. The Priority of the Practical over the Theoretical

Truth always involves a disclosure of something to someone in a particular cultural and historical context. Even scientific knowledge can never completely transcend these culturally and historically determined involvements, leaving them behind as if scientific knowledge consisted in abstractions viewed from nowhere in particular. The particularity of the phenomena disclosed by science is often disguised by the fact that they can show themselves in many different cultural and historical contexts if the laboratory conditions are right, giving rise to the illusion of disembodied knowledge.

5. Layers of Experience

These three implications suggest a way of ordering the kinds of contributions that a phenomenology can make to the philosophy of science. For there are several different phases – focal lengths, one might say – at which to set one’s phenomenology, and it is important to distinguish between them. The focal length can be trained within the laboratory on laboratory life, and investigate the attitudes, practices, and objects encountered in the laboratory. These, however, are nested in the laboratory environment and in the structure of scientific knowledge, which is their exterior expression. Another phase concerns the forms of mediation, both theoretical and instrumental, and how these contextualize the phase just mentioned of attitudes, practices, and objects, and how these are related to their exterior. This phase is nested in turn in another kind of environment, the lifeworld itself, with its ethical and political motivations and power relations. The contributions of phenomenology to the philosophy of science is first of all to describe these phases and how they are nested in each other, and then to describe and characterize each. A philosophical account of science cannot begin, nor is it complete, without a description of these phases.

a. First Phase: Laboratory Life

One phase has to do with specific attitudes, practices, or objects encountered by a researcher doing research in the laboratory environment – with the phenomenology of laboratory perception. Inquiry is one issue here. Conventional textbooks often treat the history of science as a sequence of beliefs about the state of the world, as if it were like a series of snapshots. This creates problems having to do with accounting for how these beliefs change, how they connect up, and what such change implies about continuity of science. It also rings artificial from the standpoint of laboratory practice. A phenomenological approach, by contrast, considers the path of science as rather like an evolving perception, as a continual process that cannot be neatly dissected into what’s in question and what not, what you believe and what you do not. Affects of research is another issue. The moment of experience involves more than knowledge, global or local, more than iterations and reiterations. Affects like wonder, astonishment, surprise, incredulity, fascination, and puzzlement are important to inquiry, in mobilizing the transformation of the discourse and our basic way of being related to a field of inquiry. They indicate to us the presence of something more than what’s formulated, yet also not arbitrary. When something unexpected happens, it is not a matter of drawing a conceptual blank. When something unexpected and puzzling happens in the lab, it involves a discomfort from running into something that you think you should understand and you do not. Taking that discomfort with you is essential to what transformations ensue. Other key issues of the phenomenology of laboratory experience include trust, communication, data, measurement, and experiment (Crease 1993). Experiment is an especially important topic. For there is nothing automatic about experimentation; experiments are first and foremost material events in the world. Events to not produce numbers – they do not measure themselves – but do so only when an action is planned, prepared, and witnessed. An experiment, therefore, has the character of a performance, and like all performances is a historically and culturally situated hermeneutical process. Scientific objects that appear in laboratory performances may have to be brought into focus, somewhat like the ship that Merleau-Ponty describes that has run aground on the shore, whose pieces are at first mixed confusingly with the background, filling us with a vague tension and unease, until our sight is abruptly recast and we see a ship, accompanied by release of the tension and unease (Crease 1998). In the laboratory, however, what is at first latent in the background and then recognized as an entity belongs to an actively structured process. We are staging what we are trying to recognize, and the way we are staging it may interfere with our recognition and the experiment may have to be restaged to bring the object into better focus.

b. Second Phase: Forms of Mediation

Second order features have to do with understanding the contextualization of the laboratory itself. For the laboratory is a special kind of environment. The laboratory is like a garden, walled off to a large extent from the wider and wilder surrounding environment outside. Special things are grown in it that may not appear in the outside world, but yet are related to them, and which help us understand the outside world. To some extent, the laboratory can be examined as the product or embodiment of forms discursive formations imposing power and unconditioned knowledge claims (Rouse 1987). But only to a limited extent. For the laboratory is not like an institution in which all practices are supposed to work in the same way without changing. It thus cannot be understood by studying discursive formations of power and knowledge exclusively; it is unlike a prison or military camp. A laboratory is a place designed to make it possible to stage performances that show themselves at times as disruptive of discourse, to explore such performances and make sure there really is a disruption, and then to foster creation of a new discourse.

c. Third Phase: Contextualization of Research

A third phase has to do with the contextualization of research itself, with approaches to the whole of the world, and with understanding why human beings have come to privilege certain kinds of inquiry over others. The lifeworld – a kind of horizon or atmosphere in which we think, pre-loaded with powerful metaphors and images and deeply embedded habits of thought – has its own character and changes over time. This character affects everyone in it, scientists and philosophers who think about science. The conditions of the lifeworld can, for instance, seduce us into thinking that only the measurable is the real. This is the kind of layer addressed by Husserl’s Crisis (Husserl 1970), Heidegger’s “The Question Concerning Technology,” (Heidegger 1977) and so forth. The distinction between the second and third phases thus parallels the distinction in sociology of science between micro-sociology and macro-sociology.

6. Phenomenology and Specific Sciences

Phenomenology has also been shown to contribute to understanding certain features or developments in contemporary theories which seem of particular significance for science itself, including relativity, quantum mechanics, and evolution.

a. Relativity

Ryckman (2005) highlights the role of phenomenology in understanding the structure and implications of general relativity and of certain other developments in contemporary physics. The key has to do with the role of general covariance, or the requirement that objects must be specified without any reference to a dynamical background space-time setting. Fields, that is, are not properties of space-time points or regions, they are those points and regions. The result of the requirement of general covariance is thus to remove the physical objectivity of space and time as independent of the mass and energy distribution that shapes the geometry of physical space and time. This, Ryckman writes, is arguably its “most philosophically significant aspect," for it specifies “what is a possible object of fundamental physical theory.”  The point was digested by transcendental philosophers who could understand relativity. One was Cassirer, who saw that covariance could not be treated as a principle of coordination between intuitions and formalisms, and thus was not part of the “subjective” contribution to science, as Schlick and his follower Hans Reichenbach were doing. Rather, it amounted to a restriction on what was allowed as a possible object of field theory to begin with. The requirement of general covariance meant that relativity was about a universe in which objects did not flit about on a space-time stage, but were that stage. Ryckman’s book also demonstrates the role of phenomenology in Weyl’s classic treatment of relativity, and in his formulation of the gauge principle governing the identity of units of measurement. Phenomenology thus played an important role in the articulation of general relativity, and certain concepts central to modern physics.

b. Quantum Mechanics

Phenomenology may also contribute to explaining the famous disparity between the clarity and correctness of the theory and the obscurity and inaccuracy of the language used to speak about its meaning. In Quantum Mechanics and Objectivity (Heelan 1965) and other writings (Heelan 1975), Heelan applies phenomenological tools to this issue. His approach is partly Heideggerian and partly Husserlian. What is Heideggerian is the insistence on the moment prior to object-constitution, the self-aware context or horizon or world or open space in which something appears. The actual appear­ing (or phenomenon) to the self is a second moment. This Heelan analyses in a Husserlian way by studying the intentionality structure of object constitution and insisting on the duality therein of its (embodied subjective) noetic and (embodied objective) noematic poles. “The noetic aspect is an open field of connected scientific questions addressed by a self-aware situated researcher to empirical experience; the noematic aspect is the response obtained from the situated scientific experiment by the experiencing researcher. The totality of actual and possible answers constitutes a horizon of actual and possible objects of human knowledge and this we call a World.”  (Heelan 1965, x; also 3-4). The world then becomes the source of meaning of the word “real,” which is defined as what can appear as an object in the world. The ever-changing and always historical laboratory environment with all its ever-to-be-updated instrumentation and technologies belongs to the noetic pole; it is what makes the objects of science real by bringing them into the world in the act of measurement. Measure­ment involves “an interaction with a measuring instrument capable of yielding macroscopic sensible data, and a theory capable of explaining what it is that is measured and why the sensible data are observable symbols of it” (Heelan 1965, 30-1). The difference between quantum and classical physics does not lie in the intervention of the observer’s subjectivity but in the nature of the quantum object: “[W]hile in classical physics this is an idealised normative (and hence abstract) object, in quantum physics the object is an individual instance of its idealised norm” (Heelan 1965, xii). For while in classical physics deviations of variables from their ideal norms are treated independently in a statistically based theory of errors, the variations (statistical distribution) of quantum measurements are systematically linked in one formalism. The apparent puzzle raised by the “reduction of the wave packet” is thus explained via an account of measurement. In the “orthodox” interpretation, the wave function is taken to be the “true” reality, and the act of measurement is seen as changing the incoming wave packet into one of its component eigen functions by an anonymous random choice. The sensible outcome of this change is the eigenvalue of the outgoing wave function which is read from the measuring instrument. (An eigen function, very simply, is a function which has the property that, when an operation is performed on it, the result is that function multiplied by a constant, which is called the eigenvalue.) The agent of this transformation is the human spirit or mind as a doer of mathematics. Heelan also sees this process as depending on the conscious choice and participation of the scientist-subject, but through a much different process. The formulae relate, not to the ideal object in an absolute sense, apart from all human history, culture, and language, but to the physical situation in which the real object is placed, yielding a particular instance of an ensemble or system that admits of numerous potential experimental realizations. The reduction of the wave packet then “is nothing more than the expression of the scientist’s choice and implementation of a measuring process; the post-measurement outcome is different from the means used to prepare the pure state” prior to the implementation of the measurement (Heelan 1965, 184). The wave function describes a situation which is imperfectly described as a fact of the real world; it describes a field of possibilities. That does not mean there is more-to-be-discovered (“hidden variables”) which will make it a part of the real world, nor that only human participation is able to bring it into the real world, but that what becomes a fact of the real world does so by being fleshed out by an instrumental environment to one or another complementary presentations. Heelan’s work therefore shows the value of Continental approaches to the philosophy of science, and exposes the shortcomings of approaches to the philosophy of science which relegate such themes to “somewhere between mysticism and crossword puzzles” (Heelan 1965, x).

c. Evolution

One of the ­most significant discover­ies of 20th century phe­nomenology was of what is variously called em­bodiment, lived body, flesh, or animate form, the experiences of which are that of a unified, self-aware being, and which cannot be understood apart from reflection on con­crete human experience. The body is not a bridge that connects subject and world, but rather a primordial and unsurpassab­le unity productive of there being persons and worlds at all. Husserl was aware even of the significance of evolution and move­ment. His use of the expression “animate organism” betrays a recognition that he was discussing “something not exclusive to humans, that is, something broader and more funda­mental than human animate organism” (Sheets-Johnstone 1999, 132); thus, a need to discuss matters across the evolutionary spec­trum. Failing to examine our evolutionary heritage, in fact, means misconceiving the wellsprin­gs of our humanity (Sheets-Johnstone 1999). Biologists who developed phenomenological treatments of animal behavior include von Uxhull, to whom Heidegger refers in the section on animals in Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics, and Adolph Portmann, both of whom discussed the animal’s umwelt. And Sheets-Johnstone has emphasized that phenome­nology needs to ­examine not only the ontogenet­ic dimension B infant behavior B but also the phylogenetic one. ­­­­­­If we treat human animate form as unique we shirk our phenomenologic­al duties and end up with incomplete and distorted accounts containing implicit and unexamined notions. “[G]enuine understandings of consciousness demand close and serious study of evolution as a history of animate form” (Sheets-Johnstone 1999, 42).

7. Conclusion

Developing a phenomenological account of science is important for the philosophy of science insofar as it has the potential to move us beyond a dead-end in which that discipline has entrapped itself. The dead-end involves having to choose between: on the one hand, assuming that a fixed, stable order pre-exists human beings that is uncovered or approximated in scientific activity; and on the other hand, assuming that the order is imposed by the outside. Each approach is threatened, though in different ways, by the prospect of having to incorporate a role for history and culture. Phenomenology is not as threatened, for its core doctrine of intentionality implies that parts are only understood against the background of wholes and objects against the background of their horizons, and that while we discover objects as invariants within horizons, we also discover ourselves as those worldly embodied presences to whom the objects appear. It thus provides an adequate philosophical foundation for reintroducing history and culture into the philosophy of the natural sciences.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Babich, Babette, 2010. “Early Continental Philosophy of Science,” in A. Schrift, ed., The History of Continental Philosophy, V. 3, Durham: Acumen, 263-286.
  • Cairns, Dorion, 1999. “The Theory of Intentionality in Husserl,” ed. by L. Embree, F. Kersten, and R. Zaner, Journal of the British Society for Phenomenology 32: 116-124.
  • Cassirer, E. 1944. “The Concept of Group and the Theory of Perception,” tr. A. Gurwitsch, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, pp. 1-35.
  • Chasan, S. 1992. “Bibliography of Phenomenological Philosophy of Natural Science,” in Hardy & Embree, 1992, pp. 265-290.
  • Crease, R. 1993. The Play of Nature. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Crease, R. ed. 1997. Hermeneutics and the Natural Sciences. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Crease, R. 1998. “What is an Artifact?”  Philosophy Today, SPEP Supplement, 160-168.
  • Crease, R. 2009. “Covariant Realism.”  Human Affairs 19, 223-232.
  • Crease, R. 2011. “Philosophy Rules.”  Physics World, August 2011.
  • Ginev, D. 2006. The Context of Constitution: Beyond the Edge of Epistemological Justification. Boston: Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science.
  • Gurwitsch, A. 1966. “The Last Work of Husserl,” Studies in Phenomenology and Psychology, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1966, pp. 397-447.
  • Gutting, G. (ed.). 2005  Continental Philosophy of Science. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Hardy, L., and Embree, L., 1992. Phenomenology of Natural Science. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Heelan, P. 1965. Quantum Mechanics and Objectivity. The Hague: Nijhoff.
  • Heelan, P. 1967. Horizon, Objectivity and Reality in the Physical Sciences. International Philosophical Quarterly 7, 375-412.
  • Heelan, P. 1969. The Role of Subjectivity in Natural Science, Proc. Amer. Cath. Philos. Assoc. Washington, D.C.
  • Heelan, P. 1970a. Quantum Logic and Classical Logic: Their Respective Roles, Synthese 21: 2 - 33.
  • Heelan, P. 1970b. Complementarity, Context-Dependence and Quantum Logic. Foundations of Physics 1, 95-110.
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Author Information

Robert P. Crease
Stony Brook University
U. S. A.