Renaissance Philosophy

The Renaissance, that is, the period that extends roughly from the middle of the fourteenth century to the beginning of the seventeen century, was a time of intense, all-encompassing, and, in many ways, distinctive philosophical activity. A fundamental assumption of the Renaissance movement was that the remains of classical antiquity constituted an invaluable source of excellence to which debased and decadent modern times could turn in order to repair the damage brought about since the fall of the Roman Empire. It was often assumed that God had given a single unified truth to humanity and that the works of ancient philosophers had preserved part of this original deposit of divine wisdom. This idea not only laid the foundation for a scholarly culture that was centered on ancient texts and their interpretation, but also fostered an approach to textual interpretation that strove to harmonize and reconcile divergent philosophical accounts. Stimulated by newly available texts, one of the most important hallmarks of Renaissance philosophy is the increased interest in primary sources of Greek and Roman thought, which were previously unknown or little read. The renewed study of Neoplatonism, Stoicism, Epicureanism, and Skepticism eroded faith in the universal truth of Aristotelian philosophy and widened the philosophical horizon, providing a rich seedbed from which modern science and modern philosophy gradually emerged.

Table of Contents

  1. Aristotelianism
  2. Humanism
  3. Platonism
  4. Hellenistic Philosophies
  5. New Philosophies of Nature
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Aristotelianism

Improved access to a great deal of previously unknown literature from ancient Greece and Rome was an important aspect of Renaissance philosophy. The renewed study of Aristotle, however, was not so much because of the rediscovery of unknown texts, but because of a renewed interest in texts long translated into Latin but little studied, such as the Poetics, and especially because of novel approaches to well-known texts. From the early fifteenth century onwards, humanists devoted considerable time and energy to making Aristotelian texts clearer and more precise. In order to rediscover the meaning of Aristotle’s thought, they updated the Scholastic translations of his works, read them in the original Greek, and analyzed them with philological techniques. The availability of these new interpretative tools had a great impact on the philosophical debate. Moreover, in the four decades after 1490, the Aristotelian interpretations of Alexander of Aphrodisias, Themistius, Ammonius, Philoponus, Simplicius, and other Greek commentators were added to the views of Arabic and medieval commentators, stimulating new solutions to Aristotelian problems and leading to a wide variety of interpretations of Aristotle in the Renaissance period.

The most powerful tradition, at least in Italy, was that which took Averroes’s works as the best key for determining the true mind of Aristotle. Averroes’s name was primarily associated with the doctrine of the unity of the intellect. Among the defenders of his theory that there is only one intellect for all human beings, we find Paul of Venice (d. 1429), who is regarded as the founding figure of Renaissance Averroism, and Alessandro Achillini (1463–1512), as well as the Jewish philosopher Elijah del Medigo (1458–1493). Two other Renaissance Aristotelians who expended much of their philosophical energies on explicating the texts of Averroes are Nicoletto Vernia (d. 1499) and Agostino Nifo (c. 1469–1538). They are noteworthy characters in the Renaissance controversy about the immortality of the soul mainly because of the remarkable shift that can be discerned in their thought. Initially they were defenders of Averroes’s theory of the unity of the intellect, but from loyal followers of Averroes as a guide to Aristotle, they became careful students of the Greek commentators, and in their late thought both Vernia and Nifo attacked Averroes as a misleading interpreter of Aristotle, believing that personal immortality could be philosophically demonstrated.

Many Renaissance Aristotelians read Aristotle for scientific or secular reasons, with no direct interest in religious or theological questions. Pietro Pomponazzi (1462–1525), one of the most important and influential Aristotelian philosophers of the Renaissance, developed his views entirely within the framework of natural philosophy. In De immortalitate animae (Treatise on the Immortality of the Soul, 1516), arguing from the Aristotelian text, Pomponazzi maintained that proof of the intellect’s ability to survive the death of the body must be found in an activity of the intellect that functions without any dependence on the body. In his view, no such activity can be found because the highest activity of the intellect, the attainment of universals in cognition, is always mediated by sense impression. Therefore, based solely on philosophical premises and Aristotelian principles, the conclusion is that the entire soul dies with the body. Pomponazzi’s treatise aroused violent opposition and led to a spate of books being written against him. In 1520, he completed De naturalium effectuum causis sive de incantationibus (On the Causes of Natural Effects or On Incantations), whose main target was the popular belief that miracles are produced by angels and demons. He excluded supernatural explanations from the domain of nature by establishing that it is possible to explain those extraordinary events commonly regarded as miracles in terms of a concatenation of natural causes. Another substantial work is De fato, de libero arbitrio et de praedestinatione (Five Books on Fate, Free Will and Predestination), which is regarded as one of the most important works on the problems of freedom and determinism in the Renaissance. Pomponazzi considers whether the human will can be free, and he considers the conflicting points of view of philosophical determinism and Christian theology.

Another philosopher who tried to keep Aristotle’s authority independent of theology and subject to rational criticism, is Jacopo Zabarella (1533–1589), who produced an extensive body of work on the nature of logic and scientific method. His goal was the retrieval of the genuine Aristotelian concepts of science and scientific method, which he understood as the indisputable demonstration of the nature and constitutive principles of natural beings. He developed the method of regressus, a combination of the deductive procedures of composition and the inductive procedures of resolution that came to be regarded as the proper method for obtaining knowledge in the theoretical sciences. Among his main works are the collected logical works Opera logica (1578), which are mainly devoted to the theory of demonstration, and his major work on natural philosophy, De rebus naturalibus (1590). Zabarella’s work was instrumental in a renewal of natural philosophy, methodology, and theory of knowledge.

There were also forms of Aristotelian philosophy with strong confessional ties, such as the branch of Scholasticism that developed on the Iberian Peninsula during the sixteenth century. This current of Hispanic Scholastic philosophy began with the Dominican School founded in Salamanca by Francisco de Vitoria (1492–1546) and continued with the philosophy of the newly founded Society of Jesus, among whose defining authorities were Pedro da Fonseca (1528–1599), Francisco de Toledo (1533–1596), and Francisco Suárez (1548–1617). Their most important writings were in the areas of metaphysics and philosophy of law. They played a key role in the elaboration of the law of nations (jus gentium) and the theory of just war, a debate that began with Vitoria’s Relectio de iure belli (A Re-lecture of the Right of War, 1539) and continued with the writings of Domingo de Soto (1494–1560), Suárez, and many others. In the field of metaphysics, the most important work is Suárez’ Disputationes metaphysicae (Metaphysical Disputations, 1597), a systematic presentation of philosophy—against the background of Christian principles—that set the standard for philosophical and theological teaching for almost two centuries.

2. Humanism

The humanist movement did not eliminate older approaches to philosophy, but contributed to change them in important ways, providing new information and new methods to the field. Humanists called for a radical change of philosophy and uncovered older texts that multiplied and hardened current philosophical discord. Some of the most salient features of humanist reform are the accurate study of texts in the original languages, the preference for ancient authors and commentators over medieval ones, and the avoidance of technical language in the interest of moral suasion and accessibility. Humanists stressed moral philosophy as the branch of philosophical studies that best met their needs. They addressed a general audience in an accessible manner and aimed to bring about an increase in public and private virtue. Regarding philosophy as a discipline allied to history, rhetoric, and philology, they expressed little interest in metaphysical or epistemological questions. Logic was subordinated to rhetoric and reshaped to serve the purposes of persuasion.

One of the seminal figures of the humanist movement was Francesco Petrarca (1304–1374). In De sui ipsius et multorum aliorum ignorantia (On His Own Ignorance and That of Many Others), he elaborated what was to become the standard critique of Scholastic philosophy. One of his main objections to Scholastic Aristotelianism is that it is useless and ineffective in achieving the good life. Moreover, to cling to a single authority when all authorities are unreliable is simply foolish. He especially attacked, as opponents of Christianity, Aristotle’s commentator Averroes and contemporary Aristotelians that agreed with him. Petrarca returned to a conception of philosophy rooted in the classical tradition, and from his time onward, when professional humanists took interest in philosophy, they nearly always concerned themselves with ethical questions. Among those he influenced were Coluccio Salutati (1331–1406), Leonardo Bruni (c.1370–1444) and Poggio Bracciolini (1380–1459), all of whom promoted humanistic learning in distinctive ways.

One of the most original and important humanists of the Quattrocento was Lorenzo Valla (1406–1457). His most influential writing was Elegantiae linguae Latinae (Elegances of the Latin Language), a handbook of Latin language and style. He is also famous for having demonstrated, on the basis of linguistic and historical evidence, that the so-called Donation of Constantine, on which the secular rule of the papacy was based, was an early medieval forgery. His main philosophical work is Repastinatio dialecticae et philosophiae (Reploughing of Dialectic and Philosophy), an attack on major tenets of Aristotelian philosophy. The first book deals with the criticism of fundamental notions of metaphysics, ethics, and natural philosophy, while the remaining two books are devoted to dialectics.

Throughout the fifteenth and early sixteenth century, humanists were unanimous in their condemnation of university education and their contempt for Scholastic logic. Humanists such as Valla and Rudolph Agricola (1443–1485), whose main work is De inventione dialectica (On Dialectical Invention, 1479), set about to replace the Scholastic curriculum, based on syllogism and disputation, with a treatment of logic oriented toward the use of persuasion and topics, a technique of verbal association aiming at the invention and organization of material for arguments. According to Valla and Agricola, language is primarily a vehicle for communication and debate, and consequently arguments should be evaluated in terms of how effective and useful they are rather than in terms of formal validity. Accordingly, they subsumed the study of the Aristotelian theory of inference under a broader range of forms of argumentation. This approach was taken up and developed in various directions by later humanists, such as Mario Nizolio (1488–1567), Juan Luis Vives (1493–1540), and Petrus Ramus (1515–1572).

Vives was a Spanish-born humanist who spent the greater part of his life in the Low Countries. He aspired to replace the Scholastic tradition in all fields of learning with a humanist curriculum inspired by education in the classics. In 1519, he published In Pseudodialecticos (Against the Pseudodialecticians), a satirical diatribe against Scholastic logic in which he voices his opposition on several counts. A detailed criticism can be found in De disciplinis (On the Disciplines, 1531), an encyclopedic work divided into three parts: De causis corruptarum artium (On the Causes of the Corruption of the Arts), a collection of seven books devoted to a thorough critique of the foundations of contemporary education; De tradendis disciplinis (On Handing Down the Disciplines), five books where Vives’s educational reform is outlined; and De artibus (On the Arts), five shorter treatises that deal mainly with logic and metaphysics. Another area in which Vives enjoyed considerable success was psychology. His reflections on the human soul are mainly concentrated in De anima et vita (On the Soul and Life, 1538), a study of the soul and its interaction with the body, which also contains a penetrating analysis of the emotions.

Ramus was another humanist who criticized the shortcomings of contemporary teaching and advocated a humanist reform of the arts curriculum. His textbooks were the best sellers of their day and were very influential in Protestant universities  in the later sixteenth century. In 1543, he published Dialecticae partitiones (The Structure of Dialectic), which in its second edition was called Dialecticae institutiones (Training in Dialectic), and Aristotelicae animadversions (Remarks on Aristotle). These works gained him a reputation as a virulent opponent of Aristotelian philosophy. He considered his own dialectics, consisting of invention and judgment, to be applicable to all areas of knowledge, and he emphasised the need for learning to be comprehensible and useful, with a particular stress on the practical aspects of mathematics. His own reformed system of logic reached its definitive form with the publication of the third edition of Dialectique (1555).

Humanism also supported Christian reform. The most important Christian humanist was the Dutch scholar Desiderius Erasmus (c.1466–1536). He was hostile to Scholasticism, which he did not consider a proper basis for Christian life, and put his erudition at the service of religion by promoting learned piety (docta pietas). In 1503, he published Enchiridion militis christiani (Handbook of the Christian Soldier), a guide to the Christian life addressed to laymen in need of spiritual guidance, in which he developed the concept of a philosophia Christi. His most famous work is Moriae encomium (The Praise of Folly), a satirical monologue first published in 1511 that touches upon a variety of social, political, intellectual, and religious issues. In 1524, he published De libero arbitrio (On Free Will), an open attack a one central doctrine of Martin Luther’s theology: that the human will is enslaved by sin. Erasmus’s analysis hinges on the interpretation of relevant biblical and patristic passages and reaches the conclusion that the human will is extremely weak, but able, with the help of divine grace, to choose the path of salvation.

Humanism also had an impact of overwhelming importance on the development of political thought. With Institutio principis christiani (The Education of a Christian Prince, 1516), Erasmus contributed to the popular genre of humanist advice books for princes. These manuals dealt with the proper ends of government and how best to attain them. Among humanists of the fourteenth century, the most usual proposal was that a strong monarchy should be the best form of government. Petrarca, in his account of princely government that was written in 1373 and took the form of a letter to Francesco da Carrara, argued that cities ought to be governed by princes who accept their office reluctantly and who pursue glory through virtuous actions. His views were repeated in quite a few of the numerous “mirror for princes” (speculum principis) composed during the course of the fifteenth century, such as Giovanni Pontano’s De principe (On the Prince, 1468) and Bartolomeo Sacchi’s De principe (On the Prince, 1471).

Several authors exploited the tensions within the genre of “mirror for princes” in order to defend popular regimes. In Laudatio florentinae urbis (Panegyric of the City of Florence), Bruni maintained that justice can only be assured by a republican constitution. In his view, cities must be governed according to justice if they are to become glorious, and justice is impossible without liberty.

The most important text to challenge the assumptions of princely humanism, however, was Il principe (The Prince), written by the Florentine Niccolò Machiavelli (1469–1527) in 1513, but not published until 1532. A fundamental belief among the humanists was that a ruler needs to cultivate a number of qualities, such as justice and other moral values, in order to acquire honour, glory, and fame. Machiavelli deviated from this view claiming that justice has no decisive place in politics. It is the ruler’s prerogative to decide when to dispense violence and practice deception, no matter how wicked or immoral, as long as the peace of the city is maintained and his share of glory maximized. Machiavelli did not hold that princely regimes were superior to all others. In his less famous, but equally influential, Discorsi sopra la prima deca di Tito Livio (Discourses on the First Ten Books of Titus Livy, 1531), he offers a defense of popular liberty and republican government that takes the ancient republic of Rome as its model.

3. Platonism

During the Renaissance, it gradually became possible to take a broader view of philosophy than the traditional Peripatetic framework permitted. No ancient revival had more impact on the history of philosophy than the recovery of Platonism. The rich doctrinal content and formal elegance of Platonism made it a plausible competitor of the Peripatetic tradition. Renaissance Platonism was a product of humanism and marked a sharper break with medieval philosophy. Many Christians found Platonic philosophy safer and more attractive than Aristotelianism. The Neoplatonic conception of philosophy as a way toward union with God supplied many Renaissance Platonists with some of their richest inspiration. The Platonic dialogues were not seen as profane texts to be understood literally, but as sacred mysteries to be deciphered.

Platonism was brought to Italy by the Byzantine scholar George Gemistos Plethon (c.1360–1454), who, during the Council of Florence in 1439, gave a series of lectures that he later reshaped as De differentiis Aristotelis et Platonis (The Differences between Aristotle and Plato). This work, which compared the doctrines of the two philosophers (to Aristotle’s great disadvantage), initiated a controversy regarding the relative superiority of Plato and Aristotle. In the treatise In calumniatorem Platonis (Against the Calumniator of Plato), Cardinal Bessarion (1403–1472) defended Plethon against the charge levelled against his philosophy by the Aristotelian George of Trebizond (1396–1472), who in Comparatio philosophorum Aristotelis et Platonis (A Comparison of the Philosophers Aristotle and Plato) had maintained that Platonism was unchristian and actually a new religion.

The most important Renaissance Platonist was Marsilio Ficino (1433–1499), who translated Plato’s works into Latin and wrote commentaries on several of them. He also translated and commented on Plotinus’s Enneads and translated treatises and commentaries by Porphyry, Iamblichus, Proclus, Synesius, and other Neoplatonists. He considered Plato as part of a long tradition of ancient theology (prisca theologia) that was inaugurated by Hermes and Zoroaster, culminated with Plato, and continued with Plotinus and the other Neoplatonists. Like the ancient Neoplatonists, Ficino assimilated Aristotelian physics and metaphysics and adapted them to Platonic purposes. In his main philosophical treatise, Theologia Platonica de immortalitate animorum (Platonic Theology on the Immortality of Souls, 1482), he put forward his synthesis of Platonism and Christianity as a new theology and metaphysics, which, unlike that of many Scholastics, was explicitly opposed to Averroist secularism. Another work that became very popular was De vita libri tres (Three Books on Life, 1489) by Ficino; it deals with the health of professional scholars and presents a philosophical theory of natural magic.

One of Ficino’s most distinguished associates was Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (1463–1494). He is best known as the author of the celebrated Oratio de hominis dignitate (Oration on the Dignity of Man), which is often regarded as the manifesto of the new Renaissance thinking, but he also wrote several other prominent works. They include Disputationes adversus astrologiam divinatricem (Disputations against Divinatory Astrology), an influential diatribe against astrology; De ente et uno (On Being and the One), a short treatise attempting to reconcile Platonic and Aristotelian metaphysical views; as well as Heptaplus (Seven Days of Creation), a mystical interpretation of the Genesis creation myth. He was not a devout Neoplatonist like Ficino, but rather an Aristotelian by training and in many ways an eclectic by conviction. He wanted to combine Greek, Hebrew, Muslim, and Christian thought into a great synthesis, which he spelled out in nine hundred theses published as Conclusiones in 1486. He planned to defend them publicly in Rome, but three were found heretical and ten others suspect. He defended them in Apologia, which provoked the condemnation of the whole work by Pope Innocent VIII. Pico’s consistent aim in his writings was to exalt the powers of human nature. To this end he defended the use of magic, which he described as the noblest part of natural science, and Kabbalah, a Jewish form of mysticism that was probably of Neoplatonic origin.

Platonic themes were also central to the thought of Nicholas of Cusa (1401–1464), who linked his philosophical activity to the Neoplatonic tradition and authors such as Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius. The main problem that runs through his works is how humans, as finite created beings, can think about the infinite and transcendent God. His best-known work is De docta ignorantia (On Learned Ignorance, 1440), which gives expression to his view that the human mind needs to realize its own necessary ignorance of what God is like, an ignorance that results from the ontological and cognitive disproportion between God and the finite human knower. Correlated to the doctrine of learned ignorance is that of the coincidence of opposites in God. All things coincide in God in the sense that God, as undifferentiated being, is beyond all opposition. Two other works that are closely connected to De docta ignorantia are De coniecturis (On Conjectures), in which he denies the possibility of exact knowledge, maintaining that all human knowledge is conjectural, and Apologia docta ignorantiae (A Defense of Learned Ignorance, 1449). In the latter, he makes clear that the doctrine of learned ignorance is not intended to deny knowledge of the existence of God, but only to deny all knowledge of God’s nature.

One of the most serious obstacles to the reception and adoption of Platonism in the early fifteenth century was the theory of Platonic love. Many scholars were simply unable to accept Plato’s explicit treatment of homosexuality. Yet by the middle of the sixteenth century this doctrine had become one of the most popular elements of Platonic philosophy. The transformation of Platonic love from an immoral and offensive liability into a valuable asset represents an important episode in the history of Plato’s re-emergence during the Renaissance as a major influence on Western thought.

Bessarion and Ficino did not deny that Platonic love was essentially homosexual in outlook, but they insisted that it was entirely honourable and chaste. To reinforce this point, they associated Platonic discussions of love with those found in the Bible. Another way in which Ficino made Platonic love more palatable to his contemporaries was to emphasise its place within an elaborate system of Neoplatonic metaphysics. But Ficino’s efforts to accommodate the theory to the values of a fifteenth-century audience did not include concealing or denying that Platonic love was homoerotic. Ficino completely accepted the idea that Platonic love involved a chaste relationship between men and endorsed the belief that the soul’s spiritual ascent to ultimate beauty was fuelled by love between men.

In Gli Asolani (1505), the humanist Pietro Bembo (1470–1547) appropriated the language of Platonic love to describe some aspects of the romance between a man and a woman. In this work, love was presented as unequivocally heterosexual. Most of the ideas set out by Ficino are echoed by Bembo. However, Ficino had separated physical love, which had women as its object, from spiritual love, which was shared between men. Bembo’s version of Platonic love, on the other hand, dealt with the relationship between a man and a woman which gradually progresses from a sexual to a spiritual level. The view of Platonic love formulated by Bembo reached its largest audience with the humanist Baldesar Castiglione’s (1478–1529) Il libro del cortegiano (The Courtier, 1528). Castiglione carried on the trend, initiated by Bessarion, of giving Platonic love a strongly religious coloring, and most of the philosophical content is taken from Ficino.

One of the most popular Renaissance treatises on love, Dialoghi d’amore (Dialogues of Love, 1535), was written by the Jewish philosopher Judah ben Isaac Abravanel, also known as Leone Ebreo (c.1460/5–c.1520/5). The work consists of three conversations on love, which he conceives of as the animating principle of the universe and the cause of all existence, divine as well as material. The first dialogue discusses the relation between love and desire; the second the universality of love; and the third, which provides the longest and most sustained philosophical discussion, the origin of love. He draws upon Platonic and Neoplatonic sources, as well as on the cosmology and metaphysics of Jewish and Arabic thinkers, which are combined with Aristotelian sources in order to produce a synthesis of Aristotelian and Platonic views.

4. Hellenistic Philosophies

Stoicism, Epicureanism, and Skepticism underwent a revival over the course of the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries as part of the ongoing recovery of ancient literature and thought. The revival of Stoicism began with Petrarca, whose renewal of Stoicism moved along two paths. The first one was inspired by Seneca and consisted in the presentation, in works such as De vita solitaria (The Life of Solitude) and De otio religioso (On Religious Leisure), of a way of life in which the cultivation of the scholarly work and ethical perfection are one. The second was his elaboration of Stoic therapy against emotional distress in De secreto conflictu curarum mearum (On the Secret Conflict of My Worries), an inner dialogue of the sort prescribed by Cicero and Seneca, and in De remediis utriusque fortunae (Remedies for Good and Bad Fortune, 1366), a huge compendium based on a short apocryphal tract attributed at the time to Seneca.

While many humanists shared Petrarca’s esteem for Stoic moral philosophy, others called its stern prescriptions into question. They accused the Stoics of suppressing all emotions and criticized their view for its inhuman rigidity. In contrast to the extreme ethical stance of the Stoics, they preferred the more moderate Peripatetic position, arguing that it provides a more realistic basis for morality, since it places the acquisition of virtue within the reach of normal human capacities. Another Stoic doctrine that was often criticized on religious grounds was the conviction that the wise man is entirely responsible for his own happiness and has no need of divine assistance.

The most important exponent of Stoicism during the Renaissance was the Flemish humanist Justus Lipsius (1547–1606), who worked hard to brighten the appeal of Stoicism to Christians. His first Neostoic work was De constantia (On Constancy, 1584), in which he promoted Stoic moral philosophy as a refuge from the horrors of the civil and religious wars that ravaged the continent at the time. His main accounts of Stoicism were Physiologia Stoicorum (Physical Theory of the Stoics) and Manuductio ad stoicam philosophiam (Guide to Stoic Philosophy), both published in 1604. Together they constituted the most learned account of Stoic philosophy produced since antiquity.

During the Middle Ages, Epicureanism was associated with contemptible atheism and hedonist dissipation. In 1417, Bracciolini found Lucretius’s poem De rerum natura, the most informative source on Epicurean teaching, which, together with Ambrogio Traversari’s translation of Diogenes Laertius’s Life of Epicurus into Latin, contributed to a more discriminating appraisal of Epicurean doctrine and a repudiation of the traditional prejudice against the person of Epicurus himself. In a letter written in 1428, Francesco Filelfo (1398–1481) insisted that, contrary to popular opinion, Epicurus was not “addicted to pleasure, lewd and lascivious,” but rather “sober, learned and venerable.” In the epistolary treatise Defensio Epicuri contra Stoicos, Academicos et Peripateticos (Defense of Epicurus against Stoics, Academics and Peripatetics), Cosma Raimondi (d. 1436) vigorously defended Epicurus and the view that the supreme good consists in pleasure both of the mind and the body. He argued that pleasure, according to Epicurus, is not opposed to virtue, but both guided and produced by it. Some humanists tried to harmonize Epicurean with Christian doctrine. In his dialogue De voluptate (On Pleasure, 1431), which was two years later reworked as De vero falsoque bono (On the True and False Good), Valla examined Stoic, Epicurean, and Christian conceptions of the true good. To the ultimate good of the Stoics, that is, virtue practiced for its own sake, Valla opposed that of the Epicureans, represented by pleasure, on the grounds that pleasure comes closer to Christian happiness, which is superior to either pagan ideal.

The revival of ancient philosophy was particularly dramatic in the case of Skepticism, whose revitalisation grew out of many of the currents of Renaissance thought and contributed to make the problem of knowledge crucial for early modern philosophy. The major ancient texts stating the Skeptical arguments were slightly known in the Middle Ages. It was in the fifteenth and sixteenth century that Sextus Empiricus’s Outlines of Pyrrhonism and Against the Mathematicians, Cicero’s Academica, and Diogenes Laertius’s Life of Pyrrho started to receive serious philosophical consideration.

The most significant and influential figure in the development of Renaissance Skepticism is Michel de Montaigne (1533–1592). The most thorough presentation of his Skeptical views occurs in Apologie de Raimond Sebond (Apology for Raymond Sebond), the longest and most philosophical of his essays. In it, he developed in a gradual manner the many kinds of problems that make people doubt the reliability of human reason. He considered in detail the ancient Skeptical arguments about the unreliability of information gained by the senses or by reason, about the inability of human beings to find a satisfactory criterion of knowledge, and about the relativity of moral opinions. He concluded that people should suspend judgment on all matters and follow customs and traditions. He combined these conclusions with fideism.

Many Renaissance appropriators of Academic and Pyrrhonian Skeptical arguments did not see any intrinsic value in Skepticism, but rather used it to attack Aristotelianism and disparage the claims of human science. They challenged the intellectual foundations of medieval Scholastic learning by raising serious questions about the nature of truth and about the ability of humans to discover it. In Examen vanitatis doctrinae gentium et veritatis Christianae disciplinae (Examination of the Vanity of Pagan Doctrine and of the Truth of Christian Teaching, 1520), Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola (1469–1533) set out to prove the futility of pagan doctrine and the truth of Christianity. He regarded Skepticism as ideally suited to his campaign, since it challenged the possibility of attaining certain knowledge by means of the senses or by reason, but left the scriptures, grounded in divine revelation, untouched. In the first part of the work, he used the Skeptical arguments contained in the works of Sextus Empiricus against the various schools of ancient philosophy; and in the second part he turned Skepticism against Aristotle and the Peripatetic tradition. His aim was not to call everything into doubt, but rather to discredit every source of knowledge except scripture and condemn all attempts to find truth elsewhere as vain.

In a similar way, Agrippa von Nettesheim (1486–1535), whose real name was Heinrich Cornelius, demonstrated in De incertitudine et vanitate scientiarum atque artium (On the Uncertainty and Vanity of the Arts and Sciences, 1530) the contradictions of scientific doctrines. With stylistic brilliance, he described the controversies of the established academic community and dismissed all academic endeavors in view of the finitude of human experience, which in his view comes to rest only in faith.

The fame of the Portuguese philosopher and medical writer Francisco Sanches (1551–1623) rests mainly on Quod nihil scitur (That Nothing Is Known, 1581), one of the best systematic expositions of philosophical Skepticism produced during the sixteenth century. The treatise contains a radical criticism of the Aristotelian notion of science, but beside its critical aim, it had a constructive objective, which posterity has tended to neglect, consisting in Sanches’s quest for a new method of philosophical and scientific inquiry that could be universally applied. This method was supposed to be expounded in another book that was either lost, remained unpublished, or was not written at all.

5. New Philosophies of Nature

In 1543, Nicolaus Copernicus (1473–1543) published De revolutionibus orbium coelestium (On the Revolutions of the Heavenly Spheres), which proposed a new calculus of planetary motion based on several new hypotheses, such as heliocentrism and the motion of the earth. The first generation of readers underestimated the revolutionary character of the work and regarded the hypotheses of the work only as useful mathematical fictions. The result was that astronomers appreciated and adopted some of Copernicus’s mathematical models but rejected his cosmology. Yet, the Aristotelian representation of the universe did not remain unchallenged and new visions of nature, its principles, and its mode of operation started to emerge.

During the sixteenth century, there were many philosophers of nature who felt that Aristotle’s system could no longer regulate honest inquiry into nature. Therefore, they stopped trying to adjust the Aristotelian system and turned their backs on it altogether. It is hard to imagine how early modern philosophers, such as Francis Bacon (1561–1626), Pierre Gassendi (1592–1655,) and René Descartes (1596–1650), could have cleared the ground for the scientific revolution without the work of novatores such as Bernardino Telesio (1509–1588), Francesco Patrizi (1529–1597), Giordano Bruno (1548–1600), and Tommaso Campanella (1568–1639).

Telesio grounded his system on a form of empiricism, which maintained that nature can only be understood through sense perception and empirical research. In 1586, two years before his death, he published the definitive version of his work De rerum natura iuxta propria principia (On the Nature of Things according to their Own Principles). The book is a frontal assault on the foundations of Peripatetic philosophy, accompanied by a proposal for replacing Aristotelianism with a system more faithful to nature and experience. According to Telesio, the only things that must be presupposed are passive matter and the two principles of heat and cold, which are in perpetual struggle to occupy matter and exclude their opposite. These principles were meant to replace the Aristotelian metaphysical principles of matter and form. Some of Telesio’s innovations were seen as theologically dangerous and his philosophy became the object of vigorous attacks. De rerum natura iuxta propria principia was included on the Index of Prohibited Books published in Rome in 1596.

Through the reading of Telesio’s work, Campanella developed a profound distaste for Aristotelian philosophy and embraced the idea that nature should be explained through its own principles. He rejected the fundamental Aristotelian principle of hylomorphism and adopted instead Telesio’s understanding of reality in terms of the principles of matter, heat, and cold, which he combined with Neoplatonic ideas derived from Ficino. His first published work was Philosophia sensibus demonstrata (Philosophy as Demonstrated by the Senses, 1591), an anti-Peripatetic polemic in defense of Telesio’s system of natural philosophy. Thereafter, he was censured, tortured, and repeatedly imprisoned for his heresies. During the years of his incarceration, he composed many of his most famous works, such as De sensu rerum et magia (On the Sense of Things and On Magic, 1620), which sets out his vision of the natural world as a living organism and displays his keen interest in natural magic; Ateismus triomphatus (Atheism Conquered), a polemic against both reason of state and Machiavelli’s conception of religion as a political invention; and Apologia pro Galileo (Defense of Galileo), a defense of the freedom of thought (libertas philosophandi) of Galileo and of Christian scientists in general. Campanella’s most ambitious work is Metaphysica (1638), which constitutes the most comprehensive presentation of his philosophy and whose aim is to produce a new foundation for the entire encyclopedia of knowledge. His most celebrated work is the utopian treatise La città del sole (The City of the Sun), which describes an ideal model of society that, in contrast to the violence and disorder of the real world, is in harmony with nature.

In contrast to Telesio, who was a fervent critic of metaphysics and insisted on a purely empiricist approach in natural philosophy, Patrizi developed a program in which natural philosophy and cosmology were connected with their metaphysical and theological foundations. His Discussiones peripateticae (Peripatetic Discussions) provides a close comparison of the views of Aristotle and Plato on a wide range of philosophical issues, arguing that Plato’s views are preferable on all counts. Inspired by such Platonic predecessors as Proclus and Ficino, Patrizi elaborated his own philosophical system in Nova de universalis philosophia (The New Universal Philosophy, 1591), which is divided in four parts: Panaugia, Panarchia, Pampsychia, and Pancosmia. He saw light as the basic metaphysical principle and interpreted the universe in terms of the diffusion of light. The fourth and last part of the work, in which he expounded his cosmology showing how the physical world derives its existence from God, is by far the most original and important. In it, he replaced the four Aristotelian elements with his own alternatives: space, light, heat, and humidity. Gassendi and Henry More (1614–1687) adopted his concept of space, which indirectly came to influence Newton.

A more radical cosmology was proposed by Bruno, who was an extremely prolific writer. His most significant works include those on the art of memory and the combinatory method of Ramon Llull, as well as the moral dialogues Spaccio de la bestia trionfante (The Expulsion of the Triumphant Beast, 1584), Cabala del cavallo pegaseo (The Kabbalah of the Pegasean Horse, 1585) and De gl’heroici furori (The Heroic Frenzies, 1585). Much of his fame rests on three cosmological dialogues published in 1584: La cena de le ceneri (The Ash Wednesday Supper), De la causa, principio et uno (On the Cause, the Principle and the One) and De l’infinito, universo et mondi (On the Infinite, the Universe and the Worlds). In these, with inspiration from Lucretius, the Neoplatonists, and, above all, Nicholas of Cusa, he elaborates a coherent and strongly articulated ontological monism. Individual beings are conceived as accidents or modes of a unique substance, that is, the universe, which he describes as an animate and infinitely extended unity containing innumerable worlds. Bruno adhered to Copernicus’s cosmology but transformed it, postulating an infinite universe. Although an infinite universe was by no means his invention, he was the first to locate a heliocentric system in infinite space. In 1600, he was burned at the stake by the Inquisition for his heretical teachings.

Even though these new philosophies of nature anticipated some of the defining features of early modern thought, many of their methodological characteristics appeared to be inadequate in the face of new scientific developments. The methodology of Galileo Galilei (1564–1642) and of the other pioneers of the new science was essentially mathematical. Moreover, the development of the new science took place by means of methodical observations and experiments, such as Galileo’s telescopic discoveries and his experiments on inclined planes. The critique of Aristotle’s teaching formulated by natural philosophers such as Telesio, Campanella, Patrizi, and Bruno undoubtedly helped to weaken it, but it was the new philosophy of the early seventeenth century that sealed the fate of the Aristotelian worldview and set the tone for a new age.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Allen, M. J. B., & Rees, V., eds., Marsilio Ficino: His Theology, his Philosophy, his Legacy (Leiden: Brill, 2002).
  • Bellitto, C., & al., eds., Introducing Nicholas of Cusa: A Guide to a Renaissance Man (New York: Paulist Press, 2004).
  • Bianchi, L., Studi sull’aristotelismo del Rinascimento (Padua: Il Poligrafo, 2003).
  • Blum, P. R., ed., Philosophers of the Renaissance (Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press, 2010).
  • Copenhaver, B. P., & Schmitt, C. B., Renaissance Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992).
  • Damiens, S., Amour et Intellect chez Leon l’Hébreu (Toulouse: Edouard Privat Editeur, 1971).
  • Dougherty, M. V., ed., Pico della Mirandola: New Essays (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008).
  • Ernst, G., Tommaso Campanella: The Book and the Body of Nature, transl. D. Marshall (Dordrecht: Springer, 2010).
  • Fantazzi, C., ed., A Companion to Juan Luis Vives (Leiden: Brill, 2008).
  • Gatti, H., ed., Giordano Bruno: Philosopher of the Renaissance (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2002).
  • Granada, M. A., La reivindicación de la filosofía en Giordano Bruno (Barcelona: Herder, 2005).
  • Guerlac, R., Juan Luis Vives against the Pseudodialecticians: A Humanist Attack on Medieval Logic (Dordrecht: Reidel, 1979).
  • Hankins, J., Plato in the Italian Renaissance, 2 vols. (Leiden: Brill, 1990).
  • Hankins, J., Humanism and Platonism in the Italian Renaissance, 2 vols. (Rome: Edizioni di storia e letteratura, 2003–4).
  • Hankins, J., ed., The Cambridge Companion to Renaissance Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).
  • Headley, J. M., Tommaso Campanella and the Transformation of the World (Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1997).
  • Kraye, J., Classical Traditions in Renaissance Philosophy (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2002).
  • Mack, P., Renaissance Argument: Valla and Agricola in the Traditions of Rhetoric and Dialectic (Leiden: Brill, 1993).
  • Mahoney, E. P., Two Aristotelians of the Italian Renaissance: Nicoletto Vernia and Agostino Nifo (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2000).
  • Mikkeli, H., An Aristotelian Response to Renaissance Humanism: Jacopo Zabarella on the Nature of Arts and Sciences (Helsinki: Societas Historica Finlandiae, 1992).
  • Nauert, C. A., Agrippa and the Crisis of Renaissance Thought (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 1965).
  • Nauta, L., In Defense of Common Sense: Lorenzo Valla’s Humanist Critique of Scholastic Philosophy (Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press, 2009).
  • Noreña, C. G., Juan Luis Vives (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1970).
  • Ong, W. J., Ramus: Method and the Decay of Dialogue (Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press).
  • Paganini, G., & Maia Neto, J. R., eds., Renaissance Scepticisms (Dordrecht: Springer, 2009).
  • Pine, M. L., Pietro Pomponazzi: Radical Philosopher of the Renaissance (Padova: Antenore, 1986).
  • Popkin, R. H., The History of Scepticism from Savonarola to Bayle (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003).
  • Rummel, E., The Humanist-Scholastic Debate in the Renaissance and Reformation (Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press, 1995).
  • Schmitt, C. B., Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola (1469–1533) and His Critique of Aristotle (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1967).
  • Schmitt, C. B., Cicero Scepticus: A Study of the Influence of the Academica in the Renaissance (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1972).
  • Schmitt, C. B., Aristotle and the Renaissance (Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press, 1983).
  • Schmitt, C. B., & al., eds., The Cambridge History of Renaissance Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988).
  • Skinner, Q., The Foundations of Modern Political Thought, vol. 1, The Renaissance (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1978).
  • Yates, F. A., Giordano Bruno and the Hermetic Tradition (London: Rouledge & Kegan Paul, 1964).

Author Information

Lorenzo Casini
Uppsala University

Pluralist Theories of Truth

Truth pluralism (or ‘alethic’ pluralism) is a view about the nature of truth. Broadly speaking, the thought behind the view is that truth may require different treatments for different kinds of subject matter. In particular, there is the prospect for it to be consistent to conceive of truth in a realist manner for discourse about the material world, while maintaining an anti-realist notion of truth for discourse about subjects that are perhaps more mind-dependent in character, such as discourse about ethics or comedy. Contemporary pluralist theories of truth have their roots in William James’s pragmatism. The literature on truth pluralism is expanding rapidly; new avenues of research on the subject are constantly being explored. This article introduces the central motivations, frameworks, and problems for the view which have preoccupied much of the discussion to date in contemporary analytic philosophy. Part 1 gives a brief history of some of the main inspirations behind the views outlined in contemporary debates. Part 2 goes through some preliminary issues. Part 3 outlines one of the main motivations for truth pluralism. Part 4 details the main formulations of the view that have been offered, and discusses the problems each formulation faces. Finally, Part 5 discusses some concerns about the general approach of the view.

Table of Contents

  1. A Brief History of Truth Pluralism
  2. Truth Pluralism Preliminaries
  3. Motivations for Truth Pluralism
  4. Forms of Truth Pluralism
    1. Simple Alethic Pluralism
      1. The Problem of Mixed Inferences (Form 1)
      2. The Problem of Mixed Compounds (Form 1)
      3. Norm of Inquiry
      4. Generalizations
    2. One Concept Many Properties
      1. The Problem of Mixed Inferences (Form 2)
      2. The Problem of Mixed Compounds (Form 2)
      3. Norm of Inquiry
      4. Generalizations
    3. Second-Order Functionalism
    4. Manifestation Functionalism
    5. Disjunctivism and Simple Determination Pluralism
  5. General Issues
    1. The Problem of Domain Individuation
    2. The Demandingness Objection
    3. Problems with Platitudes
    4. The Deflationary Challenge
  6. References and Further Reading

1. A Brief History of Truth Pluralism

The majority of this article is focused on a contemporary debate in analytical philosophy, but, of course, debates about the nature of truth are long-established in the history of philosophy, and in a variety of philosophical traditions. Some of the more prominent theories are correspondence theories, coherence theories, pragmatist theories, identity theories, and deflationary theories, and there are of course a number of different varieties of each of these views (for more information on these theories, see the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy article on Truth).

Contemporary pluralist theories of truth have their roots in William James’s pragmatism (though he himself disliked the name), which is outlined most prominently in his collection of lectures entitled Pragmatism, first published in 1907. James himself took true beliefs to be those beliefs that served some useful purpose, but recognised that there are many different ways that beliefs can be useful, often depending on the kinds of things the beliefs were about, with observational beliefs, moral beliefs, and mathematical beliefs, being just a few examples. Moreover, James noted that what made these different kinds of beliefs useful might vary from case to case. For instance, for observational beliefs we might think that their utility is established by their being verified, for mathematical beliefs by being capable of being proved, and for moral beliefs by cohering with other moral beliefs we have. Thus, although James held the general pragmatist thesis that for a belief to be true is for it to be useful:

Our account of truth is an account of truths in the plural…having only this quality in common: that they pay. (James 1975: 104)

He also held that there were various different ways in which beliefs could be useful:

To copy a reality is, indeed, one way of agreeing with it, but it is by no means essential. (James 1975: 102)

The spirit of James’s approach was built on in the mid-20th Century by Michael Dummett, who, in his famous 1959 essay ‘Truth’, very much echoed James when he wrote:

The question is not whether [“true” and “false”] are in practice applied to ethical statements, but whether, if they are so applied, the point of doing so would be the same as the point of applying them to statements of other kinds, and, if not, in what ways it would be different. (Dummett 1978: 3)

Perhaps the first explicit statement of the kind of pluralism found in contemporary debates is given by Alan White in his 1957 essay, “Truth as Appraisal”. Like James, White held that there is some unity to the use of the word true, but he instead holds that this unity is supplied by the term’s use as a term of appraisal, as a way to commend a particular statement. White held a ‘dual-aspect’ theory of truth, which held that this appraisal-aspect is combined with a descriptive aspect, which states the criteria for establishing when the term ‘true’ is used correctly. White then argued that these criteria vary according to the subject matter of the statement, holding that different ‘theories’ of truth, such as correspondence theory and coherence theory are apt to give the criteria for the correct use of ‘true’ in different cases.

With the rise of deflationary theories of truth in the mid to late 20th Century, James and White’s observations received perhaps less attention than they deserved. The general project of truth pluralism was revitalized, however, by the publication of Crispin Wright’s 1992 book Truth and Objectivity, which aimed to place a broadly pluralist account of truth at the heart of a new method of understanding debates about realism and anti-realism. Wright’s book had significant influence in a number of different areas of philosophy, and provoked considerable debate. In the 21st Century, Michael P. Lynch, along with Crispin Wright, has further developed the project of truth pluralism, and his 2009 book Truth as One and Many is the most comprehensive single study of truth pluralism and its potential implications to date. As we will see below, there are many different ways to understand the exact specification of truth pluralism, but before we approach these it will be useful to try to get to the heart of what drives each of these views, and to clarify some of the terminology commonly used.

2. Truth Pluralism Preliminaries

The basic idea behind all forms of truth pluralism is that the analysis of truth may require different treatment for different kinds of subject matter. This idea is normally spelled out using the notion of a domain of discourse (or region of thought). This is a formalization of the idea that human thought and discourse can be about a large number of different subjects. For instance, we may debate about whether a particular joke is funny, whether an action is morally wrong, whether the earth goes around the sun, or whether there is a largest prime number. The thought is that these debates concern very different things, and this needs to be taken into account when we come to analyse the claims made in them.

The truth pluralist draws upon these intuitive distinctions when it comes to the matter of investigating the nature of truth. As we will see below, truth pluralists have reason to think that there are important things to be said about the nature of truth, but typically – at least at some stage of the theory – hold that the question of what needs to be said is addressed on a domain-by-domain basis. That is, they are unhappy with the thought that we can give an account of the nature of truth without taking into account the subject-matter of the claims of which truth is predicated. A full account of the nature of truth, on the pluralist view, will need to look at truth in a specific domain, as opposed to (or as well as) what constitutes truth per se.

Before moving on to the motivations for truth pluralism, and the various forms of the view, it is worth briefly pausing to note some distinctions which are important in the truth pluralism literature. These distinctions are between the truth predicate, the truth concept, and the truth property. The truth predicate, typically taking the form ‘is true’ is the linguistic entity appended to certain sentences, as in “‘snow is white” is true’. One who competently uses the words 'true' and 'truth' can be said to possess the concept of truth, and an analysis of the concept of truth will aim to uncover what those conditions of competent use consist in. The property of truth is what is ascribed by the truth predicate.

To get clearer on these distinctions, consider the following analogy with water (this analogy is originally due to Alston (1996), and is also emphasised by Wright (2001) and Lynch (2009)). We have the predicate ‘is water’, which we use to say of a certain substance that it is water (for example, ‘the liquid in the bottle is water’). We also have the concept of water, that any competent user of the term ‘water’ understands (for example, that water is a clear, colourless, tasteless liquid, that it comes out of taps, and runs through rivers and streams). We also have the property of being water, which is what the stuff that corresponds to the concept, and is referred to by the predicate, consists in. Scientific discoveries have deemed the property of water to be identical to the property of being H2O, and this tells us what the nature of water is. In the water case, then, the system works as follows. We have the water predicate, which is used to ascribe a particular property – being water – to particular substances. Competent users of the water predicate will be said to possess the concept of water, and this concept demarcates a kind of worldly substance. The property of water captures the essence of this worldly substance (H­2O). Note also that it is not a condition on competent users of the concept that they be aware of the nature of the property (as indeed was not the case before the discovery of water as H2O): possessing the concept does not necessarily require possessing knowledge of the essence of the property.

Most of the investigations into the nature of truth concern the essence of the truth property. However, as we will see, in the story of truth pluralism, the concept of truth has an important role to play. (For more on the concept/property distinction in this context, and how the nature of the truth property may not be transparent from the truth concept, see Alston 2002.)

It is also worth saying a little about truth-bearers before we progress. There are a number of different things that philosophers have taken to be the bearers of truth, with beliefs, statements, sentences, utterances of sentences, and propositions to be perhaps the most prominent examples. One form of truth pluralism would perhaps be a view which held that all of these potential bearers are genuine truth-bearers, and that there are different kinds of truth appropriate to each bearer. This would be an interesting kind of truth pluralism, though it is not a view which seems to necessarily share the same motivations as the views discussed here. For the purposes of this article, we will follow the majority of truth pluralists in holding that it is propositions that are the primary bearers of truth, and when we speak of sentences, utterances, or beliefs as being true it is in the sense that they express a proposition that is true.

3. Motivations for Truth Pluralism

Correspondence theories of truth may appear to be intuitively attractive: they promise to make truth a matter of a relation between linguistic or mental entities and the separate objects and properties that they purport to represent. However, subscribing to such a view about truth for a particular domain of discourse carries with it significant metaphysical commitments: in other words, it can be thought of as implying that there are mind-independent facts of the matter which our statements, thoughts or beliefs map onto. This has posed particular problems about employing the notion of truth in the moral domain, for example, where the idea of there being mind-independent facts of the matter causes a degree of uneasiness (see, for example, Mackie 1977). It also causes problems in the mathematical domain, where we might be more comfortable thinking that there are mind-independent facts of the matter, but, due to the abstract nature of the facts involved, the notion of ‘mapping onto’ these facts seems misguided. Thoughts along these lines have been expressed by Lynch (2009) as what he calls the ‘Scope Problem’, which suggests that each existing ‘robust’ theory of truth (such as correspondence and coherence theories) is limited to accounting only for the truth of claims of a certain type. (See Dodd 2012 and Edwards 2011b for further discussion of the strength of the Scope Problem.)

It is tempting to respond to this uneasiness by denying that truth is applicable in these problematic domains, and adopting ‘expressivist’ or ‘fictionalist’ views of the subject matter instead, for example. However, pulling in the opposite direction is the attractive view of minimal truth-aptness. This is the thought that a domain of discourse can sustain a notion of truth in virtue of meeting very basic standards of syntactic discipline (see, for example, Boghossian 1990, Wright 1992), allowing them to express propositions which are, in turn, apt for truth. The basic idea is that a domain will qualify as being syntactically disciplined if its component sentences can be used as the antecedents of conditionals, be negated, and feature as the targets of propositional attitude statements. In addition to these features, if a domain is syntactically disciplined then there is a distinction between seeming to be right and being right, along with the intelligibility of speakers saying ‘I used to think that p but now I realize I was mistaken’. Moral discourse, for example, plausibly meets these standards. We often say things like ‘I used to think that eating meat was morally wrong, but now I realize I was mistaken’, or ‘I wonder whether abortion is morally wrong’. We can also note that moral sentences, such as ‘murder is wrong’, can feature as the antecedents of conditionals, such as ‘if murder is wrong, then those that murder will be punished’, or be negated, as in ‘it is not the case that murder is right’, which – on the terms of the view - are further hallmarks of sentences which express truth-apt propositions. Consequently, it is not so clear that we can give up on truth in these domains. But that seems to lead us back into an implausible realism, and herein lies the problem.

However, one may well point out that this is not such a problem, as there is already a plausible, and popular, theory of truth which explains how these kinds of claims are truth-apt, and without any unwanted metaphysical baggage: so-called ‘deflationary’ theories of truth (see, for example, Horwich 1998, Field 1994, and Stoljar and Damnjanovic 2010 for an overview of deflationary theories). The deflationist insists that the truth predicate exists just to perform certain logical functions, such as the endorsement of a proposition, or generalisation over a potentially infinite number of propositions. Deflationary theories of truth thus typically focus on the use of the truth predicate, and the possession of the truth concept, as opposed to the truth property. (See Devitt 2001 for a good discussion of the project undertaken by deflationists.) Deflationism though may be able to give us the resources to explain how all of the classes of sentences we are considering can be true, but it does so at the cost of being unable to use truth as an explanatory resource when attempting to understand other concepts, and requires revision to some of our basic thoughts that connect truth to other concepts of philosophical interest (for discussion see, for example, Lynch 2004a, Davidson 1999, Field 1986). There are also concerns that deflationism is an internally unstable view, outlined in Wright’s (1992) ‘inflationary argument’ (for further discussion see Horwich 1996 and 1998, Rumfitt 1995, van Cleve 1996, Kölbel 1997 and Miller 2001). I will not go into these problems in depth here, but suffice to say that deflationism does not offer a problem-free solution to the problem under discussion.

The truth pluralist agrees with the deflationist that all of the domains we have considered contain sentences that are capable of expressing true propositions. However, the truth pluralist does not think, like the deflationist, that this is the end of the matter. There is a story to tell about the nature of truth, the pluralist thinks, but this story will not always be the same. According to the truth pluralist, there will be a property in virtue of which the propositions expressed by sentences in a particular domain of discourse will be true, but this property will change depending on the domain we are considering. In other words, although the notion of truth as correspondence to the facts might fit our domain of discourse about the material world, a different notion of truth - perhaps one with less metaphysical baggage, constructed out of coherence, or justification or warrant (for example Wright’s notion of ‘superassertibility’ – see Wright 1992) - may fit the domains in which the correspondence notion looks problematic. Consequently, truth pluralism offers a treatment of truth which allows for a wide range of beliefs, sentences and the like to be true, although holding onto the idea that there are interesting things to say about truth.

There are thus initially two constraints on all truth pluralist theories. They must:

(1) Adequately explain how truth is to be analysed differently in different domains of discourse, and

(2) Ensure that truth is held to be robust enough to avoid the criticisms of deflationism.

With these motivations in mind, we will now examine some of the specific formulations of the view. Note that the versions I will be looking at will be those that hold that there are roles for different types of properties, such as correspondence and coherence, to play in the different accounts of truth in different domains, but there are also views of a pluralist persuasion which hold that truth is always correspondence, with there being different kinds of correspondence (for example Horgan 2001, Sher 2004).

4. Forms of Truth Pluralism

a. Simple Alethic Pluralism

The first option is a view which Lynch calls ‘Simple Alethic Pluralism’ (SAP) (Lynch does not hold the view, and it is unclear whether anyone ever has – though some attribute the view to Wright’s (1992) formulation of truth pluralism, which speaks of a plurality of truth predicates. Wright has since clarified his position – see below). Recalling the differences between concept and property noted above, this view holds that there are different concepts of truth in different domains of discourse. That is, that the concept of truth in discourse about the material world is identified with the concept of corresponding to fact, and the concept of truth in arithmetic is identified with the concept of coherence. Associated with each of these concepts will be their corresponding predicates and properties, so, if the concept of truth changes from domain to domain, the content of the truth predicate and the nature of the truth property will also change from domain to domain. On this view, then, there are different concepts, predicates and properties associated with the word ‘true’ in different domains of discourse.

Returning to the two dimensions of meaning that we discussed earlier, SAP holds that the meaning of ‘true’ varies from domain to domain at both the level of concept and property. It varies at the level of concept as different concepts are associated with ‘true’ in different domains, and it varies at the level of property as different properties are associated with the different concepts in different domains. One implication of this view, then, is that – at least on the two dimensions of meaning discussed – there is no domain-invariant meaning of ‘true’: the meaning of the predicate always depends on the subject-matter to which it is attributed, and is thus multiply ambiguous.

We will now turn to discuss the main problems for the SAP formulation of truth pluralism.

i. The Problem of Mixed Inferences (Form 1)

On the SAP view, truth (both as predicate and property) is tied to specific domains of discourse. However, as Tappolet (1997) pointed out, our reasoning frequently mixes statements from different domains. Consider the following example:

(1) This cat is wet

(2) This cat is funny

Therefore, this cat is wet and funny

Validity of arguments is traditionally understood as necessary preservation of truth, but how could we understand the validity of this argument on the SAP view? To make the point explicit, let us use the truth predicates from different domains:

(1*) ‘This cat is wet’ is truem

(2*) ‘This cat is funny’ is truec

Therefore, ‘this cat is wet and funny’ is true?

Disregarding for the moment the issue of what truth predicate applies to the conclusion (see the problem of mixed compounds below), this reformulation of the argument is invalid as different truth predicates are applied to each premise and conclusion, thus rendering the argument guilty of the fallacy of equivocation. Appeal to properties will not help either, as different truth properties correspond to each different truth predicate, thus ensuring that no single property is preserved across the inference (see below and Pedersen 2006 for detailed further discussion of the different aspects of this problem).

ii. The Problem of Mixed Compounds (Form 1)

Now consider compound claims, like conjunctions or disjunctions. Tappolet (2000) observes that we often make compounds of claims from different domains of discourse, such as the already mentioned ‘this cat is wet and funny’. (Williamson 1994 makes a similar point.) We have already noted that there is some puzzlement over what truth predicate could apply to this conjunction, but, more worryingly, Tappolet states, is that there is a basic statement about conjunctions, namely that a conjunction is true iff its conjuncts are true. If different truth predicates apply to the conjunction and to the conjuncts, then principles like this look under threat, once more from concerns about equivocation. These principles seem to require a general truth predicate, but SAP can provide none.

iii. Norm of Inquiry

One of the main motivations for moving beyond deflationism is to accommodate the thought that truth constitutes a norm of inquiry. It seems on the face of it as though SAP can accommodate this thought as there are different truth properties in different domains of discourse. However, Lynch (2006) argues that we need to read this constraint as the need for truth to constitute a single general norm of inquiry. All SAP would give us is lots of different norms (truth-in-ethics, truth-in-mathematics, and so forth) which would provide different norms for different domains of discourse, as opposed to a single general norm that all assertions (regardless of domain) aim at. If Lynch’s argument is correct, then, SAP has trouble accommodating the normative dimension of truth.

iv. Generalizations

One common use of the truth predicate is to make general claims, such as ‘Everything Socrates said is true’. This effectively allows us to endorse everything Socrates said without having to re-assert everything he did say. But how could we understand this usage on the SAP view? In particular, what truth predicate appears in the statement? For instance, suppose that Socrates remarks on a wide variety of subjects, from the weather to what is morally good to the axioms of set theory. All of these claims would seemingly be subject to different truth predicates, so how is a general claim like ‘Everything Socrates said is true’ even expressible without the aid of a general truth predicate?

b. The One Concept Many Properties View (OCMP)

The second option, due to Crispin Wright (1992, 2001, 2003), holds that there is a single concept of truth, held fixed across domains, and different truth properties which satisfy this concept in different domains. This view aims to hold one aspect of the meaning of the predicate ‘true’ fixed across domains – namely the concept associated with ‘true’ – although accommodating diversity of content by holding that there are different properties of truth in different domains, identified by their ability to (locally) satisfy the truth concept.

On this view, the content of the concept of truth is specified by a list of ‘platitudes’ about truth, which are taken to be truths about truth, knowable a priori, which specify the features that truth is taken to necessarily have, often by reference to connections between truth and other closely related concepts. Some candidate platitudes are as follows:

Transparency. That to assert a proposition is to present it as true and, more generally, that any attitude to a proposition is an attitude to its truth – that to believe, doubt, or fear, for example, that p is to believe, doubt, or fear that p is true.

(E). <p> is true iff p. (Note: ‘<p>’ here and below stands for ‘the proposition that p’, following Horwich’s (1998) notation.)

Embedding. A proposition’s aptitude for truth is preserved under a variety of operations - in particular, truth-apt propositions have negations, conjunctions, disjunctions, and so forth, which are likewise truth-apt.

Straight-talking. A true proposition ‘tells it like it is’, in some way.

Contrast. A proposition may be true but not justified, or justified but not true.

Stability. If a proposition is ever true, then it always is, so that whatever may, at any particular time, be truly asserted may - perhaps by appropriate transformations of mood, or tense - be truly asserted at any time.

Absoluteness. Truth is absolute - there is, strictly, no such thing as a proposition’s being more or less true; propositions are completely true if true at all.

The basic idea is that a complete list of truth platitudes will characterise the concept of truth exhaustively. This concept will be associated with the truth predicate in all of its relevant uses, regardless of the subject-matter of which it is attributed. One dimension of the meaning of ‘true’ is thus held fixed: the concept of truth with which the predicate is associated.

The aspect of meaning of ‘true’ which varies on this view is the property associated with ‘true’. What this property is will vary from one domain to the next. For example, the truth property for the empirical domain might well be correspondence, and the truth property for the mathematical domain might be coherence. Thus, at the level of property, there is variation in the nature of truth, but not variation at the level of concept.

According to Wright, a property’s ability to be considered a truth property is dependent on its ability to satisfy the following procedure. First of all, occurrences of the term ‘true’ are replaced with the name of the candidate property (so, for example, in the case of correspondence, the Contrast platitude would become “A proposition may correspond to the facts but not be justified, and vice versa”). If truth is preserved by these reformulations (that is, if all the platitudes remain true when rewritten), then, according to Wright, the property in question has the pedigree to be considered a truth property.

The method here can be compared with the methods employed by functionalists in the philosophy of mind (for example, Lewis 1972, Kim 1998) in that properties such as correspondence realize the role set out by the truth platitudes, as, for instance, c-fibers firing realize the role set out by our folk concept of pain. However, it is contentious whether Wright’s view should be understood along those lines (Lynch 2006, 2009, for example, interprets OCMP in this way, but Wright (2011) resists this interpretation).

OCMP gives us a single truth predicate, but not a single truth property. How might this help it avoid the problems posed for SAP? Not much, on first glance, but, as I will note, there has been more effort to defend OCMP than SAP on these fronts.

i. The Problem of Mixed Inferences (Form 2)

As we have a single truth predicate, the meaning of which is fixed by a single truth concept, the charge of equivocation when it comes to mixed inferences may be circumvented. However, there is still the more pressing issue of truth preservation to address. Remember that we noted that it is widely held that validity is necessary preservation of truth across an inference. This way of putting it sounds distinctly like there is a single property (truth) preserved from premises to conclusion. However, note that there is no single property of truth on the OCMP view, so different truth properties will be possessed by premises from different domains of discourse. The problem now kicks in at the level of properties: how to explain preservation of truth across mixed inferences when there is no single truth property.

Responses to this form of the problem have been offered by Beall (2000), who argues that the pluralist should adopt a conception of validity favoured by many-valued logics, and Pedersen (2006) who explores the possibility of using plural quantification. Cotnoir (2012) offers an algebraic account of how an OCMP pluralist can account for the validity of mixed inferences.

ii. The Problem of Mixed Compounds (Form 2)

The initial statement of the problem only seems to affect SAP, as it is a challenge to understand the phrase ‘a conjunction is true iff its conjuncts are true’ in the absence of a general truth predicate. As SAP is the only view which lacks a single truth predicate, it only seems to affect this view and not the others: all the other views can hold that it is the same predicate in both uses. However, there is a deeper challenge which is not averted by this response. That is to explain in what way the conjunction is true, and this can kick in just as well at the level of properties. On the OCMP view, the challenge will be to explain what truth property the mixed conjunction has. On the other views, it will be a challenge to explain which lower level property the mixed conjunction has which explains why it has the general truth property.

One route to explore is to observe that the truth of a compound is, in some sense, supervenient on its components, and to try to construct a truth (or lower level) property out of this idea. This option is explored by Edwards (2008, 2009), who, defending the OCMP view, suggests that we can understand the truth property for compounds as being the property of satisfying the rules for compounds laid out by the preferred system of logic. This option could also be extended to the other views (bar SAP) which could hold that this is the relevant lower level property for compounds that explains why they have the general truth property. This option is discussed by Cotnoir (2009), and rejected by Lynch (2009), who prefers to think of the truth of compounds as instances of truth “self-manifesting”, as a consequence of its being grounded in the truth of the components. See Lynch 2009 Chapter 5 for further discussion of this idea.

iii. Norm of Inquiry

The norm of inquiry problem seems to hold in its original form (indeed, it was originally pressed by Lynch against the OCMP view). Again, there is no general property possessed by all truths, but, if truth is to be considered a general norm of inquiry, then there needs to be a general truth property capable of grounding this norm. Insofar as OCMP cannot allow for this, it falls prey to the objection.

iv. Generalizations

The matter of generalizations is again subtle. Equipped with a general truth predicate the puzzlement over what predicate appears in the sentence ‘Everything Socrates said is true’ disappears. But, again, one may think that the problem kicks in at the level of properties. We could read the sentence as attributing a property to all the things Socrates said – the property of truth. But, we cannot take this statement at face-value on the OCMP view, as, in this case, there is no general truth property that is possessed by all the things Socrates said.

However, OCMP may have a response to this problem which draws on the solution to the problem of mixed conjunctions. If OCMP interprets ‘everything Socrates said is true’ as a long conjunction of all the things Socrates said, then perhaps it can analyze that conjunction in much the same way as the mixed conjunction discussed above. Alternatively, as Wright 2012 explores, OCMP may prefer to instead say that the same style of solution may be adopted for generalizations themselves. That is, a generalization is true just in case all of the propositions that fall under the scope of that generalization are themselves true in their appropriate ways.

The remaining views which we will discuss all allow for a general truth property, as well as a general truth predicate. As a result they seem, on the face of it, to avoid the problem of mixed inferences, norm of inquiry, generalization and mixed compounds problems, and, as a result, I will not discuss each problem in turn for each view. However, as we will see below, the norm of inquiry problem still has relevance in some cases. Also, as hinted above, there are issues over whether the mixed compounds problem will still affect these views, which are explored further in Lynch 2009 and Edwards 2008.

c. Second-Order Functionalism (SOF)

Lynch (2001a, 2004, 2006) proposes to think of truth as a functional concept. A functional concept describes the role that anything that falls under the concept must play, but it is intended to stay reasonably neutral on the issue of what it is that realizes that role. This idea originated in the philosophy of mind by way of giving a method of systematizing particular causal roles of particular mental phenomena, but Lynch extends the idea to systematize the non-causal, perhaps normative, role of truth in our cognitive lives. Lynch’s method of constructing the functional role of the concept of truth begins, like Wright’s, with the collection of a number of platitudes about truth, which locate truth on the conceptual map, linking it with the related concepts of fact, proposition and belief. Lynch’s platitudes are:

The proposition that p is true if and only if p.

The proposition that p is false if and only if it is not the case that p.

Propositions are the bearers of truth and falsity.

Every proposition has a negation.

A proposition can be justified but not true, and true but not justified. (Lynch 2001a: 730)

These platitudes form a structure which will provide a complete account of the role truth is taken to play. This structure takes the form of a ‘network analysis’ (the term is due to Smith 1994). That is, once we have our full list of platitudes, we first rewrite them slightly, replacing simple instances of ‘is true’ with ‘has the property of being true’, so that, instead of, say ‘The proposition that p is true if and only if p.’, we have ‘The proposition that p has the property of being true if and only if p.’ We then make a conjunction of all the platitudes we have collected, and replace all of the alethic concepts in the platitudes with variables. What we end up with is a condition which is billed to give us the exact specification of the ‘job description’ for truth, its ‘functional role’. (For more on this process see Lynch 2001a, and also Smith 1994 and Jackson 1998.)

This process yields a functional definition of truth, as it gives us the precise features that a property must have if it is to be regarded as realizing the truth role: it must be related to a number of other properties in the required way. As noted before, these features may be exhibited by different properties in different domains of discourse, and SOF allows for this, as, provided a property discharges the functional role set out in the network analysis, it counts as the realizer of the truth role in that particular domain of discourse.

So far, it may not seem as though there is a great deal distinguishing SOF from OCMP, but the main point of difference becomes apparent when SOF says a bit more about the truth property. Functionalists in general, according to Lynch, have two options when characterizing the truth property: they can either hold that truth is a second-order property - the property of having a property that plays the specified role - or hold – in each domain - that truth is a first-order property, that is, the property that plays that certain role in that domain. The truth property could thus be taken to be either the second-order property of possessing some property that plays the truth role, or, in each domain, the property that actually plays that role in a particular domain of discourse. SOF plumps for the former, and, as a result, the truth property is to be thought of as a second-order functional role property, not as a realizer property. There is a single second-order role property, and a plurality of realizer properties across discourses, and the truth property is to be identified with the former.


There is thus a property that all truths have in common on the SOF view. All truths will have the property of having a property that plays the truth role. As the truth property is to be identified with this second-order property, as opposed to the first-order realizer property, all truths will be true in virtue of having this second-order property, whatever their individual realizer properties are.

There are two main problems that SOF faces. The first concerns the ‘robustness’ of second-order properties. Remember that truth, considered here as a second-order property, needs to be robust enough to ground truth as a general norm of inquiry. However, one might think that the robust properties here are the first-order properties, like correspondence and coherence, as opposed to the property of having one of those properties, which seems to be a thinner, less complex property. If so, SOF provides us with a truth property which is not fit to ground truth as a general norm of inquiry, and thus fails to move the view significantly beyond OCMP (for concerns like these about second-order properties in general, see Kim 1998). The second, related, problem (raised in Lynch 2009) is that it is questionable whether the second-order truth property will satisfy the truth platitudes. Remember that to be a truth-realizing property, on a functionalist view, a property has to exhibit the features set out in the truth platitudes. The first-order properties must do this, and this is how they are identified in their domains, but does the general second-order property exhibit these features? Lynch argues not, and thus the view is unstable: it offers as a truth property a property which fails to meet its own standards for being considered a truth property.

d. Manifestation Functionalism

In Lynch 2009, Lynch presents a significant revision of his earlier proposal. Lynch maintains the central role afforded to the list of platitudes about truth, holding that the concept of truth is captured by the following (slightly different) list:

Objectivity: The belief that p is true if, and only if, with respect to the belief that p, things are as they are believed to be.

Warrant Independence: Some beliefs can be true but not warranted and some can be warranted without being true.

Norm of Belief: It is prima facie correct to believe that p if and only if the proposition that p is true.

End of Inquiry: Other things being equal, true beliefs are a worthy goal of inquiry. (Lynch 2009: 8-12)

According to MF, we ought to take the truth platitudes (or the ‘truish features’ in Lynch’s words) to specify the nature of the truth property, as well as the nature of the truth concept:

the functionalist...can claim that there is a single property and concept of truth. The property being true (or the property of truth) is the property that has the truish features essentially or which plays the truth-role as such. (Lynch 2009: 74)

MF does not disregard the ‘domain-specific’ properties, such as correspondence and superassertibility, but MF does not want to identify truth with these properties, rather that truth is manifested in these properties:

this approach allows the functionalist to claim that truth is, as it were, immanent in ontologically distinct properties. Let us say that where property F is immanent in or manifested by property M, it is a priori that F’s essential features are a subset of M’s features. (Lynch 2009: 74)

MF thus requires that the truth features - as expressed in the characterisation of the truth property - are a subset of the features of the particular domain-specific properties. That is, each of the properties that, in Lynch’s terms, ‘manifest’ truth in a domain, must contain the truth property as a proper part. So, for example, for superassertibility to manifest truth in a domain, it would have to be part of the features of superassertibility that the belief that p is superassertible if, and only if, things are as they are believed to be; that some beliefs can be superassertible but not warranted and some can be warranted without being superassertible; that it is prima facie correct to believe that p if and only if the proposition that p is superassertible; and that, other things being equal, superassertible beliefs are a worthy goal of inquiry.

A key issue for this view is the metaphysics of manifestation. Lynch claims that the metaphysics of manifestation are similar to the metaphysics of the determinate/determinable relation. A classic example of this relation is the relation between being coloured and being red. There is an asymmetry between these properties: if something is red, then, necessarily, it is coloured, whereas if something is coloured it is not necessarily red. Being red, we might say, is one way of being coloured. One way of putting this point is to say that being red is a determinate of the more general determinable, being coloured. According MF, something similar occurs in the case of truth, where properties such as correspondence and superassertibility are different ways of being true. (However, Lynch does not want to say that the manifestation relation as it occurs in the case of truth is the same as the determinate/determinable relation: see Lynch 2009: 75 for details.)

Perhaps the most pressing objection, due to Wright (2012), concerns the ability of properties such as correspondence and superassertibility to manifest truth on the terms of Lynch’s view. Recall that Lynch holds that the truth-manifesting properties contain the essential features of truth as a proper part of their own features. But, Wright argues, if Lynch’s view in general is correct, then surely one of the essential features of truth is that truth is manifested in, for example, correspondence and superassertibility. However, now it looks difficult for those properties to manifest truth, for it cannot be that correspondence and superassertibility are themselves manifested in correspondence and superassertibility. But, if this cannot be the case, then they cannot manifest truth, for they do not possess one of the essential features of truth. Lynch (2012) attempts to respond to this problem, and Wright (2012) also considers his response.

As was the case with SOF, there has also been discussion of how far MF progresses beyond deflationism, and, in particular, whether the property MF identifies with truth – the property that has the truish features essentially – is a property which is as robust as Lynch claims it to be. This issue is discussed in detail in Jarvis 2012, Edwards 2012 and Pedersen and Edwards 2011.

e. Disjunctivism and Simple Determination Pluralism

In addition to the proposals put forward by Crispin Wright and Michael Lynch, there are also a couple of emerging views in the recent literature. The first is the ‘disjunctivist’ proposal offered by Pedersen (2010) and Pedersen and C.D. Wright (2012). The basic idea behind this view is to take the basic structure of OCMP, and add an additional property that will serve as a general truth property. This property will be a disjunctive property which contains each of the domain-specific truth properties as disjuncts.

Pedersen expresses the domain-specific truth properties (of which correspondence to reality and superassertibility are examples) as properties Tl … Tn. His thought is that the existence of a further property can immediately be inferred, a ‘universal’ notion of truth - TU - defined in the following way:

(∀p)(TU (p) ↔ Tl(p) v … v Tn(p))

This states that if we have properties Tl … Tn, we can immediately infer the existence of a further property, TU, by noting that a proposition (p) has TU just when it has one of Tl … Tn. The thought is that this property, TU, has the pedigree to be considered a truth property (it is taken to be possessed by all and only truths, after all). We can call this proposal ‘disjunctivism’, as the single truth property is taken to be a disjunctive property.

The main challenge for disjunctivism is to show that the disjunctive truth property has the necessary credentials to be considered the truth property. In particular, it faces concerns that a disjunctive property is not ‘robust’ enough to meet the requirements of being a substantive norm of inquiry, and also that, as with SOF, it fails to guarantee exhibition of the features laid out in the truth platitudes. Disjunctive proposals are defended from these concerns by Pedersen and Wright (2012a) and Edwards (2012).

The second emerging view is offered by Edwards (2011a, 2012b), which draws upon Dummett’s (1978) analogy between truth and winning. Just as winning is the aim of playing a game, truth is the aim of assertion and belief. It is evident that what it takes to win differs from game to game, but there is good reason to think that winning qua property has a significant degree of constancy. The thought is that the property of being a winner is a property that one can get in a variety of different ways, and that the rules of each game establish a property the possession of which determines the possession of the property of being a winner. Thus, in each game, we get biconditionals of the form:

(Bx) When playing game x: one wins (has the property of winning) iff one possesses property F.

The thought is that this structure can be applied to the truth case. Take it that truth qua property is exhaustively accounted for by the list of platitudes about truth. We can then, for each domain, construct biconditionals of the following form:

(Bdx) In domain of discourse x: <p> is true (has the property of truth) iff <p> has property F.

There will be an order of determination on the biconditionals which reflects the explanatory primacy of the right-to-left direction. That is, in the material world domain, for example, it is because <p> corresponds to the facts that <p> is true, and not because <p> is true that <p> corresponds to the facts. It is in virtue of the order of determination on these biconditionals that we can say that the properties in question determine truth in their respective domains.

The structure of simple determination pluralism is thus as follows. Truth is given as the property that is exhaustively described by the truth platitudes. This property is the property possessed by all true propositions, regardless of domain. This allows the view to avoid the problem with SOF, as the truth property necessarily exhibits the truth features. Moreover, for each domain there will be a property that determines possession of the truth property, and these properties are held fully distinct from the truth property itself. This allows simple determination pluralism to avoid some of the problems with MF as truth itself is not considered to be manifested in the domain-specific properties. The relationship between the truth-determining properties and truth is underwritten by the order of determination on the biconditionals of the form (Bdx).

A key issue for simple determination pluralism is the specification of the relationship between the domain-specific truth-determining properties and the truth property itself. There is also the matter of how exactly the truth-determining properties are identified, and the provenance of the (Bdx) biconditionals. These issues are explored in Edwards 2011a and 2011c, and in Wright 2012.

5. General Issues

These are some of the main formulations of truth pluralism that are currently available. Evidently, the intricacies of each view are more complex than I have been able to outline here, and the reader is directed to the relevant references for more on the structure and motivations for each view. I hope, though, that it is clear that the term ‘truth pluralism’ covers a variety of different proposals which, although they share a certain general approach to truth, differ on the details.

Each proposal, then, faces specific challenges of its own, but there are also some concerns about the general project which all pluralists will need to address. I will close by briefly noting three such concerns.

a. The Problem of Domain Individuation

Truth pluralism seemingly rests on the idea that natural language can be separated into different domains of discourse. Note that this rough separation of thought and talk into different domains is not solely the work of truth pluralists, it is perhaps a separation that is subscribed to, though a lot less explicitly, by a number of different kinds of theorists. The very fact that philosophy itself is separated into different areas corresponding to these divisions might be one example: moral philosophy is taken to concern different subject matter to aesthetics, and philosophy of mathematics different to the philosophy of science. Also, those who take particular positions in these areas may be implicitly subscribing to such distinctions. One who claims to be an expressivist about moral discourse, for example, will need to be able to demarcate what is moral discourse and what is not. Likewise, one who is a fictionalist about mathematics needs some distinction between what are mathematical statements, and what are not.

However, one might think that pluralism is committed to this idea in a particularly acute way. For instance, some of the views above use the notion of a domain as a parameter when it comes to platitude satisfaction. For example, on the OCMP view, truth properties do not satisfy the truth platitudes simpliciter, they satisfy them in a specific domain. Identifying precisely what a domain of discourse is, and how, exactly, they are to be individuated is an issue which has been at the forefronts of the minds of those sceptical of the pluralist project since its inception (see, for example, Williamson 1994), and, at present, one might think that more needs to be done to ease these concerns.

b. The Demandingness Objection

The supposed benefit of being able to use different theories of truth in different domains may be considered a problem when one considers what that entails, namely that a truth pluralist is committed to defending the use of a particular theory of truth in each domain. This worry is particularly acute when one considers that there is no generally accepted version of any of the theories of truth usually cited as examples. For instance, although it may seem a benefit that truth pluralism allows correspondence theory a limited scope, it is worth noting that there is general scepticism over whether there is a satisfactory formulation of the correspondence theory to start with. The same may well be true of coherence theory. Truth pluralism thus inherits the problems with formulating each of the different theories of truth it wants to use in each of its domains. This makes it a very demanding view to defend: not only does it have to find a structure that works, it has to outline and defend each account of truth in each domain. This point is developed by C.D. Wright (2011).

c. Problems with Platitudes

All of the pluralist views I have discussed involve the notion of platitudes at some stage in the theory. As is also clear, different formulations favour slightly different platitudes. This disagreement might make us worry about the use of the term ‘platitude’, which seems to signify some uncontroversial, even obvious, principle. However, although the platitudes in each case are taken to stem from some intuitive thoughts about truth, the eventual formulations may be open to dispute (see Wright 2003: 271, and also Nolan 2009 for more on platitudes), so we should think of them as refined conceptual truths, perhaps, as opposed to simple obvious, uncontroversial, statements. Nevertheless, one might be concerned that there are no platitudes about truth: no principles that are entitled to this status. This is backed up by the fact that most (if not all) of the platitudes cited by truth pluralists have been questioned (C.D. Wright 2005 argues this point, and Lynch 2005 responds).

Usually the scepticism comes from one of two fronts: either from those who think the platitude in question is false, or from those who think the platitude in question is not about truth, and can thus be explained away without committing one to any attitude about the nature of truth. Deflationists about truth often use this second strategy, with Paul Horwich being one prominent example with his discussion of the ‘Norm of Belief’ platitude (see Horwich 1998, 2010). Wolfgang Künne (2003: Chapter 5) gives an example of the first kind of scepticism, arguing that Wright’s ‘Stability’ platitude is false. There are also concerns that even the (in)famous ‘(E)’ platitude is up for grabs, coming from those who wish to admit truth-value gaps, and those who think that the schema leads to paradox (though note that these particular concerns would affect deflationary theories just as much as pluralist theories, given their reliance on the instances of (E)).

Although, as we have seen, disagreement over a platitude does not immediately rule it out as a platitude, there are still issues over the truth of a platitude which need to be taken seriously. Even if pluralists claim that the platitudes are rough formulations approximating some conceptual truth that would be reached when appropriately refined, there is still room for scepticism.

d. The Deflationary Challenge

Throughout contemporary debates on truth pluralism, lurking in the shadows has been the challenge from deflationary theories of truth. In particular, there is an underlying puzzlement as to why we need to go beyond deflationism into pluralism. After all, deflationism and pluralism share some of the same motivations in that they are both dissatisfied with traditional ‘monist’ accounts of truth, yet the deflationary account seemingly offers a far simpler solution to this dissatisfaction, without a lot of the problems for pluralism we have discussed above. The basic worry seems to be: why bring in all of these complications when we can get by with far less? This challenge is compounded by the influence of deflationary theories of truth in current debates, with many holding that deflationism ought to be considered the default view of truth (see, for example, Field 1994, Armour-Garb Beall 2000, and Dodd 2012). As noted above, this challenge has not been ignored by pluralists, with Wright (1992) and Lynch (2009: Chapter 6) building arguments against deflationism into the motivations for their pluralist views. However, despite this work, it is probably still fair to say that one of the central challenges facing pluralists today is to convince those in the deflationary camp that there are strong reasons to consider pluralism an attractive alternative.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, W.P. 1996. A Realist Conception of Truth. Cornell University Press.
  • Alston, W.P. 2002. Truth: Concept and Property. In What is Truth? ed. R. Schantz. Berlin and New York: Walter de Gruyter: 11-26.
  • Beall, J.C. 2000. On Mixed Inferences and Pluralism about Truth Predicates. The Philosophical Quarterly Vol. 50, No. 200: 380-382.
  • Boghossian, P.A. 1990. The Status of Content. The Philosophical Review, Vol. 99, No. 2: 157-184.
  • Cotnoir, A.J. 2009. Generic Truth and Mixed Conjunctions: Some Alternatives. Analysis, Vol. 69, No.2: 473-479.
  • Cotnoir, A.J. 2012. Validity for Strong Pluralists. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.
  • Davidson, D. 1999. The Folly of Trying to Define Truth. Journal of Philosophy 93, no. 6: 263-279.
  • Devitt, M. 2001. The Metaphysics of Truth. In Lynch (ed.) 2001.
  • Dodd, J. 2012. Deflationism Trumps Pluralism! In Pedersen and Wright (eds.) 2012.
  • Dummett, M. 1978. Truth. In his Truth and Other Enigmas. Oxford University Press.
  • Edwards, D. 2008. How to Solve the Problem of Mixed Conjunctions. Analysis, Vol. 68, No. 2: 143-149.
  • Edwards, D. 2009. Truth-Conditions and the Nature of Truth: Re-Solving Mixed Conjunctions. Analysis, Vol. 69, No. 4: 684-688
  • Edwards, D. 2011a. Simplifying Alethic Pluralism. The Southern Journal of Philosophy 49: 28-48.
  • Edwards, D. 2011b. Naturalness, Representation, and the Metaphysics of Truth. European Journal of Philosophy.
  • Edwards, D. 2012a. On Alethic Disjunctivism. dialectica, Vol. 66, Issue 1: 200-214.
  • Edwards, D. 2012b. Truth, Winning, and Simple Determination Pluralism. In Pedersen and Wright (eds.) 2012.
  • Edwards, D. 2012c. Alethic vs Deflationary Functionalism. International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 20 (1): 115-124.
  • Field, H. 1986. The Deflationary Conception of Truth. In C. Wright and G. Macdonald (eds.) Fact, Science and Morality. Blackwell, Oxford: 55-119.
  • Field, H. 1994. Deflationist Views of Meaning and Content. Mind, 103: 247-285.
  • Horgan, T. 2001. Contextual Semantics and Metaphysical Realism: Truth as Indirect Correspondence. In Lynch 2001: 67-96.
  • Horwich, P. 1996. Realism Minus Truth. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 56: 877-881.
  • Horwich, P. 1998. Truth: Second Edition. Blackwell.
  • Horwich, P. 2010. Truth-Meaning-Reality. Oxford University Press.
  • Jackson, F. 1998. From Metaphysics to Ethics. Oxford University Press.
  • Jackson, F., Oppy, G. and Smith, M. 1994. Minimalism and Truth Aptness. Mind, New Series, Vol. 103, No. 411: 287-302.
  • James, W. 1975. Pragmatism and The Meaning of Truth. Harvard University Press.
  • Jarvis, B. 2012. Truth as One and Very Many. International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 20 (1):
  • Kim, J. 1998. Mind in a Physical World. MIT Press.
  • Kölbel, M. 1997. Wright’s Argument from Neutrality. Ratio NS 10: 35-47.
  • Künne, W. 2003. Conceptions of Truth. Oxford University Press.
  • Lewis, D. 1972. Psychophysical and Theoretical Identifications. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 50: 249-58.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2001. The Nature of Truth. MIT Press.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2001a. A Functionalist Theory of Truth. In Lynch 2001.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2004. Truth and Multiple Realizibility. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, Volume 82, Number 3: 384-408.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2004a. Minimalism and the Value of Truth. The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 54, No. 217: 497-517.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2005. Alethic Functionalism and our Folk Theory of Truth. Synthese Vol. 145, No. 1: 29-43.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2006. ReWrighting Pluralism. The Monist, Vol. 89, No. 1: 63-84.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2009. Truth as One and Many. Oxford University Press.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2012. Three Questions about Truth. In Pedersen and Wright (eds.) 2012.
  • Mackie, J.L. 1977. Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong. Penguin.
  • Miller, A. 2001. On Wright’s Argument against Deflationism. The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 51, No. 205: 527-531.
  • Nolan, D. 2009. Platitudes and Metaphysics. In D. Braddon-Mitchell and R. Nola (eds.) Conceptual Analysis and Philosophical Naturalism. MIT Press.
  • Pedersen, N. 2006. What Can the Problem of Mixed Inferences Teach Us about Alethic Pluralism? The Monist, Vol. 89, No. 1: 102-117.
  • Pedersen, N. 2010. Stabilizing Alethic Pluralism. The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 60, No. 238: 92-108.
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Author Information

Douglas Edwards
Northern Institute of Philosophy, University of Aberdeen
United Kingdom

Sen’s Capability Approach

Amartya SenThe Capability Approach is defined by its choice of focus upon the moral significance of individuals’ capability of achieving the kind of lives they have reason to value. This distinguishes it from more established approaches to ethical evaluation, such as utilitarianism or resourcism, which focus exclusively on subjective well-being or the availability of means to the good life, respectively. A person’s capability to live a good life is defined in terms of the set of valuable ‘beings and doings’ like being in good health or having loving relationships with others to which they have real access.

The Capability Approach was first articulated by the Indian economist and philosopher Amartya Sen in the 1980s, and remains most closely associated with him. It has been employed extensively in the context of human development, for example, by the United Nations Development Programme, as a broader, deeper alternative to narrowly economic metrics such as growth in GDP per capita. Here ‘poverty’ is understood as deprivation in the capability to live a good life, and ‘development’ is understood as capability expansion.

Within academic philosophy the novel focus of Capability Approach has attracted a number of scholars. It is seen to be relevant for the moral evaluation of social arrangements beyond the development context, for example, for considering gender justice. It is also seen as providing foundations for normative theorising, such as a capability theory of justice that would include an explicit ‘metric’ (that specifies which capabilities are valuable) and ‘rule’ (that specifies how the capabilities are to be distributed). The philosopher Martha Nussbaum has provided the most influential version of such a capability theory of justice, deriving from the requirements of human dignity a list of central capabilities to be incorporated into national constitutions and guaranteed to all up to a certain threshold.

This article focuses on the philosophical aspects of the Capability Approach and its foundations in the work of Amartya Sen. It discusses the development and structure of Sen’s account, how it relates to other ethical approaches, and its main contributions and criticisms. It also outlines various capability theories developed within the Capability Approach, with particular attention to that of Martha Nussbaum.

Table of Contents

  1. The Development of Sen’s Capability Approach
    1. Sen’s Background
    2. Sen’s Concerns
  2. Sen’s Critiques of Utilitarianism and Resourcism
    1. Utilitarianism
      1. Act-Consequentialism
      2. Welfarism
      3. Sum Ranking
    2. Resourcism
  3. Core Concepts and Structure of Sen’s Capability Approach
    1. Functionings and Capability
    2. Valuation: Which Functionings Matter for the Good Life?
    3. Evaluation: What Capability do People Have to Live a Good Life?
  4. Applying Sen’s Capability Approach
  5. Criticisms of Sen’s Capability Approach
    1. Illiberalism
    2. Under-Theorisation
    3. Individualism
    4. Information Gaps
  6. Theorising the Capability Approach
    1. Generating Lists for Empirical Research in the Social Sciences (Ingrid Robeyns)
    2. A Participatory Approach to Evaluating Capability Expansion (Sabina Alkire)
    3. Justice as Equal Capability of Democratic Citizenship (Elizabeth Anderson)
    4. Capability as Freedom from Domination (John Alexander)
  7. Martha Nussbaum’s Capability Theory of Justice
    1. Structure and Development of Nussbaum’s Capability Theory
    2. Criticisms of Nussbaum’s Theory
    3. Sen and Nussbaum
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. The Development of Sen’s Capability Approach

a. Sen’s Background

Amartya Sen had an extensive background in development economics, social choice theory (for which he received the 1998 Nobel Prize in Economics), and philosophy before developing the Capability Approach during the 1980s. This background can be pertinent to understanding and assessing Sen’s Capability Approach because of the complementarity between Sen’s contributions to these different fields. Sen’s most influential and comprehensive account of his Capability Approach, Development as Freedom (Sen 1999), helpfully synthesizes in an accessible way many of these particular, and often quite technical, contributions.

Sen first introduced the concept of capability in his Tanner Lectures on Equality of What? (Sen 1979) and went on to elaborate it in subsequent publications during the 1980s and 1990s. Sen notes that his approach has strong conceptual connections with Aristotle’s understanding of human flourishing (this was the initial foundation for Nussbaum’s alternative Capability Theory); with Adam Smith, and with Karl Marx. Marx discussed the importance of functionings and capability for human well-being. For example, Sen often cites Smith’s analysis of relative poverty in The Wealth of Nation in terms of how a country’s wealth and different cultural norms affected which material goods were understood to be a ‘necessity’. Sen also cites Marx’s foundational concern with “replacing the domination of circumstances and chance over individuals by the domination of individuals over chance and circumstances”.

b. Sen’s Concerns

The Capability Approach attempts to address various concerns that Sen had about contemporary approaches to the evaluation of well-being, namely:

(1) Individuals can differ greatly in their abilities to convert the same resources into valuable functionings (‘beings’ and ‘doings’). For example, those with physical disabilities may need specific goods to achieve mobility, and pregnant women have specific nutritional requirements to achieve good health. Therefore, evaluation that focuses only on means, without considering what particular people can do with them, is insufficient.

(2) People can internalize the harshness of their circumstances so that they do not desire what they can never expect to achieve. This is the phenomenon of ‘adaptive preferences’ in which people who are objectively very sick may, for example, still declare, and believe, that their health is fine. Therefore, evaluation that focuses only on subjective mental metrics is insufficient without considering whether that matches with what a neutral observer would perceive as their objective circumstances,.

(3) Whether or not people take up the options they have, the fact that they do have valuable options is significant. For example, even if the nutritional state of people who are fasting and starving is the same, the fact that fasting is a choice not to eat should be recognized. Therefore evaluation must be sensitive to both actual achievements (‘functionings’) and effective freedom (‘capability’).

(4) Reality is complicated and evaluation should reflect that complexity rather than take a short-cut by excluding all sorts of information from consideration in advance. For example, although it may seem obvious that happiness matters for the evaluation of how well people are doing, it is not all obvious that it should be the only aspect that ever matters and so nothing else should be considered. Therefore, evaluation of how well people are doing must seek to be as open-minded as possible. (Note: This leads to the deliberate ‘under-theorization’ of the Capability Approach that has been the source of some criticism, and it motivated the development of Nussbaum’s alternative Capability Theory.)

2. Sen’s Critiques of Utilitarianism and Resourcism

An important part of Sen’s argument for the Capability Approach relates to his critique of alternative philosophical and economics accounts. In particular, he argues that, whatever their particular strengths, none of them provide an analysis of well-being that is suitable as a general concept; they are all focused on the wrong particular things (whether utility, liberty, commodities, or primary goods), and they are too narrowly focused (they exclude too many important aspects from evaluation). Sen’s criticisms of economic utilitarianism and John Rawls’ primary goods are particularly important in the evolution of his account and its reception.

a. Utilitarianism

Economics has a branch explicitly concerned with ethical analysis (‘Welfare Economics’). Sen’s systematic criticism of the form of utilitarianism behind welfare economics identifies and rejects each of its three pillars: act consequentialism, welfarism, and sum-ranking.

i. Act-Consequentialism

According to act consequentialism, actions should be assessed only in terms of the goodness or badness of their consequences. This excludes any consideration of the morality of the process by which consequences are brought about, for example, whether it respects principles of fairness or individual agency. Sen argues instead for a ‘comprehensive consequentialism’ which integrates the moral significance of both consequences and principles. For example, it matters not only whether people have an equal capability to live a long life, but how that equality is achieved. Under the same circumstances women generally live longer than men, for largely biological reasons. If the only thing that mattered was achieving equality in the capability to live a long life this fact suggests that health care provision should be biased in favor of men. However, as Sen argues, trying to achieve equality in this way would override important moral claims of fairness which should be included in a comprehensive evaluation.

ii. Welfarism

Welfarism is the view that goodness should be assessed only in terms of subjective utility. Sen argues that welfarism exhibits both ‘valuational neglect’ and ‘physical condition neglect’. First, although welfarism is centrally concerned with how people feel about their lives, it is only concerned with psychological states, not with people’s reflective valuations. Second, because it is concerned only with feelings it neglects information about physical health, though this would seem obviously relevant to assessing well-being. Not only does subjective welfare not reliably track people’s actual interests or even their urgent needs, it is also vulnerable to what Sen calls ‘adaptive preferences’. People can become so normalized to their conditions of material deprivation and social injustice that they may claim to be entirely satisfied. As Sen puts it,

Our mental reactions to what we actually get and what we can sensibly expect to get may frequently involve compromises with a harsh reality. The destitute thrown into beggary, the vulnerable landless labourer precariously surviving at the edge of subsistence, the overworked domestic servant working round the clock, the subdued and subjugated housewife reconciled to her role and her fate, all tend to come to terms with their respective predicaments. The deprivations are suppressed and muffled in the scale of utilities (reflected by desire-fulfilment and happiness) by the necessity of endurance in uneventful survival. (Sen 1985, 21-22)

iii. Sum Ranking

Sum-ranking focuses on maximizing the total amount of welfare in a society without regard for how it is distributed, although this is generally felt to be important by the individuals concerned. Sen argues, together with liberal philosophers such as Bernard Williams and John Rawls, that sum-ranking does not take seriously the distinction between persons. Sen also points out that individuals differ in their ability to convert resources such as income into welfare. For example, a disabled person may need expensive medical and transport equipment to achieve the same level of welfare. A society that tried to maximize the total amount of welfare would distribute resources so that the marginal increase in welfare from giving an extra dollar to any person would be the same. Resources would therefore be distributed away from the sick and disabled to people who are more efficient convertors of resources into utility.

b. Resourcism

Resourcism is defined by its neutrality about what constitutes the good life. It therefore assesses how well people are doing in terms of their possession of the general purpose resources necessary for the construction of any particular good life. Sen’s criticism of John Rawls’ influential account of the fair distribution of primary goods stands in for a criticism of resourcist approaches in general. Sen’s central argument is that resources should not be the exclusive focus of concern for a fairness-based theory of justice, even if, like Rawls’s primary goods, they are deliberately chosen for their general usefulness to a good life. The reason is that this focus excludes consideration of the variability in individuals’ actual abilities to convert resources into valuable outcomes. In other words, two people with the same vision of the good life and the same bundle of resources may not be equally able to achieve that life, and so resourcists’ neutrality about the use of resources is not as fair as they believe it is. More specifically, Sen disputes Rawls’ argument that the principles of justice should be worked out first for the ‘normal’ case, in terms of a social contract conceived as a rational scheme for mutually advantageous cooperation between people equally able to contribute to society, and only later extended to ‘hard’ cases, such as of disability. Sen believes such cases are far from abnormal and excluding them at the beginning risks building a structure that excludes them permanently. The general problem is that such accounts ‘fetishize’ resources as the embodiment of advantage, rather than focusing on the relationship between resources and people. Nevertheless Sen acknowledges that although the distribution of resources should not be the direct concern in evaluating how well people are doing, it is very relevant to considerations of procedural fairness.

3. Core Concepts and Structure of Sen’s Capability Approach

This section provides a technical overview of Sen’s account.

a. Functionings and Capability

When evaluating well-being, Sen argues, the most important thing is to consider what people are actually able to be and do. The commodities or wealth people have or their mental reactions (utility) are an inappropriate focus because they provide only limited or indirect information about how well a life is going. Sen illustrates his point with the example of a standard bicycle. This has the characteristics of ‘transportation’ but whether it will actually provide transportation will depend on the characteristics of those who try to use it. It might be considered a generally useful tool for most people to extend their mobility, but it obviously will not do that for a person without legs. Even if that person, by some quirk, finds the bicycle delightful, we should nevertheless be able to note within our evaluative system that she still lacks transportation. Nor does this mental reaction show that the same person would not appreciate transportation if it were really available to her.

The Capability Approach focuses directly on the quality of life that individuals are actually able to achieve. This quality of life is analyzed in terms of the core concepts of ‘functionings’ and ‘capability’.

  • Functionings are states of ‘being and doing’  such as being well-nourished, having shelter. They should be distinguished from the commodities employed to achieve them (as ‘bicycling’ is distinguishable from ‘possessing a bike’).
  • Capability refers to the set of valuable functionings that a person has effective access to. Thus, a person’s capability represents the effective freedom of an individual to choose between different functioning combinations – between different kinds of life – that she has reason to value. (In later work, Sen refers to ‘capabilities’ in the plural (or even ‘freedoms’) instead of a single capability set, and this is also common in the wider capability literature. This allows analysis to focus on sets of functionings related to particular aspects of life, for example, the capabilities of literacy, health, or political freedom.)










Figure 1. Outline of the core relationships in the Capability Approach

Figure 1 outlines the core relationships of the Capability Approach and how they relate to the main alternative approaches focused on resources and utility. Resources (such as a bicycle) are considered as an input, but their value depends upon individuals’ ability to convert them into valuable functionings (such as bicycling), which depends, for example, on their personal physiology (such as health), social norms, and physical environment (such as road quality). An individual’s capability set is the set of valuable functionings that an individual has real access to. Achieved functionings are those they actually select. For example, an individual’s capability set may include access to different functionings relating to mobility, such as walking, bicycling, taking a public bus, and so on. The functioning they actually select to get to work may be the public bus. Utility is considered both an output and a functioning. Utility is an output because what people choose to do and to be naturally has an effect on their sense of subjective well-being (for example, the pleasure of bicycling to work on a sunny day). However the Capability Approach also considers subjective well-being – feeling happy – as a valuable functioning in its own right and incorporates it into the capability framework.

b. Valuation: Which Functionings Matter for the Good Life?

Sen argues that the correct focus for evaluating how well off people are is their capability to live a life we have reason to value, not their resource wealth or subjective well-being. But in order to begin to evaluate how people are performing in terms of capability, we first need to determine which functionings matter for the good life and how much, or at least we need to specify a valuation procedure for determining this.

One way of addressing the problem is to specify a list of the constituents of the flourishing life, and do this on philosophical grounds (Martha Nussbaum does this for her Capability Theory of Justice). Sen rejects this approach because he argues that it denies the relevance of the values people may come to have and the role of democracy (Sen 2004b). Philosophers and social scientists may provide helpful ideas and arguments, but the legitimate source of decisions about the nature of the life we have reason to value must be the people concerned. Sen therefore proposes a social choice exercise requiring both public reasoning and democratic procedures of decision-making.

One reason that social scientists and philosophers are so keen to specify a list is that it can be used as an index: by ranking all the different constituents of the flourishing life with respect to each other it would allow easier evaluation of how well people are doing. Sen’s social choice exercise is unlikely to produce collective agreement on a complete ranking of different functionings, if only because of what Rawls called the ‘fact of reasonable disagreement’. But Sen argues that substantial action-guiding agreement is possible. First, different valuational perspectives may ‘intersect’ to reach similar judgments about some issues, though by way of different arguments. Second, such agreements may be extended by introducing ‘ranges’ of weights rather than cardinal numbers. For example, if there are four conflicting views about the relative weight to be attached to literacy vis-à-vis health, of ½, ⅓, ¼ and 1/5, that contains an implicit agreement that the relative weight on education should not exceed ½, nor fall below 1/5, so having one unit of literacy and two of health would be better than having two units of literacy and one of health.

Sen does suggest that in many cases a sub-set of crucially important capabilities associated with basic needs may be relatively easily identified and agreed upon as urgent moral and political priorities. These ‘basic capabilities’, such as education, health, nutrition, and shelter up to minimally adequate levels, do not exhaust the resources of the capability approach, only the easy agreement on what counts as being scandalously deprived. They may be particularly helpful in assessing the extent and nature of poverty in developing countries. However, taking a basic capability route has implications for how the exercise of evaluating individuals’ capability can proceed, since it can only evaluate how well people’s lives are going in terms of the basics.

c. Evaluation: What Capability do People Have to Live a Good Life?

Evaluating capability is a second order exercise concerned with mapping the set of valuable functionings people have real access to. Since it takes the value of functionings as given, its conclusions will reflect any ambiguity in the valuation stage.

Assessing capability is more informationally demanding than other accounts of advantage since it not only takes a much broader view of what well-being achievement consists in but also tries to assess the freedom people actually have to choose high quality options. This is not a purely procedural matter of adding up the number of options available, since the option to purchase a tenth brand of washing powder has a rather different significance than the option to vote in democratic elections. For example, Sen argues that the eradication of malaria from an area enhances the capability of individuals living there even though it doesn’t increase the number of options those individuals have (since they don’t have the ‘option’ to live in a malarial area anymore). Because the value of a capability set represents a person’s effective freedom to live a valuable life in terms of the value of the functionings available to that individual, when the available functionings are improved, so is the person’s effective freedom.

The capability approach in principle allows a very wide range of dimensions of advantage to be positively evaluated (‘what capabilities does this person have?’). This allows an open diagnostic approach to what is going well or badly in people’s lives that can be used to reveal unexpected shortfalls or successes in different dimensions, without aggregating them all together into one number. The informational focus can be tightened depending on the purpose of the evaluation exercise and relevant valuational and informational constraints. For example, if the approach is limited to considering ‘basic capabilities’ then the assessment is limited to a narrower range of dimensions and attempts to assess deprivation – the shortfall from the minimal thresholds of those capabilities – which will exclude evaluation of how well the lives of those above the threshold are going.

As well as being concerned with how well people’s lives are going, the Capability Approach can be used to examine the underlying determinants of the relationship between people and commodities, including the following (Sen 1999, 70-71):

(1)      Individual physiology, such as the variations associated with illnesses, disability, age, and gender. In order to achieve the same functionings, people may have particular needs for non-standard commodities – such as prosthetics for a disability – or they may need more of the standard commodities – such as additional food in the case of intestinal parasites. Note that some of these disadvantages, such as blindness, may not be fully ‘correctable’ even with tailored assistance.

(2)      Local environment diversities, such as climate, epidemiology, and pollution. These can impose particular costs such as more or less expensive heating or clothing requirements.

(3)      Variations in social conditions, such as the provision of public services such as education and security, and the nature of community relationships, such as across class or ethnic divisions.

(4)      Differences in relational perspectives. Conventions and customs determine the commodity requirements of expected standards of behaviour and consumption, so that relative income poverty in a rich community may translate into absolute poverty in the space of capability. For example, local requirements of ‘the ability to appear in public without shame’ in terms of acceptable clothing may vary widely.

(5)      Distribution within the family – distributional rules within a family determining, for example, the allocation of food and health-care between children and adults, males and females.

The diagnosis of capability failures, or significant interpersonal variations in capability, directs attention to the relevant causal pathways responsible. Note that many of these interpersonal variations will also influence individuals’ abilities to access resources to begin with. For example, the physically handicapped often have more expensive requirements to achieve the same capabilities, such as mobility, while at the same time they also have greater difficulty earning income in the first place.

4. Applying Sen’s Capability Approach

The concept of a capability has a global-local character in that its definition abstracts from particular circumstances, but its realization depends on specific local requirements. For example, the same capability to be well-nourished can be compared for different people although it may require different amounts and kinds of food depending on one’s age, state of health, and so on. This makes the Capability Approach applicable across political, economic, and cultural borders. For example, Sen points out that being relatively income poor in a wealthy society can entail absolute poverty in some important capabilities, because they may require more resources to achieve. For example, the capability for employment may require more years of education in a richer society

Many capabilities will have underlying requirements that vary strongly with social circumstances (although others, such as adequate nourishment, may vary less). For example, the ‘ability to appear in public without shame’ seems a capability that people might generally be said to have reason to value, but its requirements vary significantly according to cultural norms from society to society and for different groups within each society (such as by gender, class, and ethnicity). Presently in Saudi Arabia, for example, women must have the company of a close male relative to appear in public, and require a chauffeur and private car to move between private spaces (since they are not permitted to use public transport or drive a car themselves). Strictly speaking the Capability Approach leaves open whether such ‘expensive’ capabilities, if considered important enough to be guaranteed by society as a matter of justice, should be met by making more resources available to those who need them (subsidized cars and chauffeurs), or by revising the relevant social norms. The Capability Approach only identifies such capability failures and diagnoses their causes. However, if there is general agreement in the first place that such capabilities should be equally guaranteed for all, there is a clear basis for criticizing clearly unjust social norms as the source of relative deprivation and thus as inconsistent with the spirit of such a guarantee.

The capability approach takes a multi-dimensional approach to evaluation. Often it may seem that people are generally well-off, yet a closer analysis reveals that this ‘all-things-considered’ judgement conceals surprising shortfalls in particular capabilities, for example, the sporting icon who can’t read. Capability analysis rejects the presumption that unusual achievement in some dimensions compensates for shortfalls in others. From a justice perspective, the capability approach’s relevance here is to argue that if people are falling short on a particular capability that has been collectively agreed to be a significant one, then justice would require addressing the shortfall itself if at all possible, rather than offering compensation in some other form, such as increased income.

Capability evaluation is informationally demanding and its precision is limited by the level of agreement about which functionings are valuable. However, Sen has shown that even where only elementary evaluation of quite basic capabilities is possible (for example, life-expectancy or literacy outcomes), this can still provide much more, and more relevant, action-guiding information than the standard alternatives. In particular, by making perspicuous contrasts between successes and failures the capability approach can direct political and public attention to neglected dimensions of human well-being. For example, countries with similar levels of wealth can have dramatically different levels of aggregate achievement - and inequality - on such non-controversially important dimensions as longevity and literacy. And, vice versa, countries with very small economies can sometimes score as highly on these dimensions as the richest. This demonstrates both the limitations of relying exclusively on economic metrics for evaluating development, and the fact that national wealth does not pose a rigid constraint on such achievements (that GNP is not destiny). Such analyses are easily politicized in the form of the pointed question, Why can’t we do as well as them?

Philippines South Africa
Gross National Income per capita (ppp) $ 4,002 $9,812
Life expectancy (years) 72.3 52
Mean years of schooling 8.7 8.2

Figure 2. Perspicuous contrasts: The Philippines does more with less

(Data from the 2010 UNDP Human Development Report)


5. Criticisms of Sen’s Capability Approach

This section outlines important criticisms of Sen’s approach, together with his responses.

a. Illiberalism

Liberal critics of Sen often identify the focus of the Capability Approach - ‘the ability to achieve the kind of lives we have reason to value’ - as problematic because it appears to impose an external valuation of the good life, whatever people may actually value. Rawls, for example, notes that the reason for liberals to focus on the fair allocation of general purpose resources rather than achievement is that this best respects each individual’s fundamental right to pursue their own conception of the good life. This relates to Rawls’ conception of justice as political rather than metaphysical: it is not the task of justice to assess people’s achievements, but rather to ensure the fairness of the conditions of participation in a society. Justice should be neutral with regard to judging different people’s conceptions of the good. But this neutrality seems incompatible with the Capability Approach’s concern with assessing people’s achievements, which would seem to require a much more substantive view of what counts as a good life than one needs for assessing general purpose resources. Rawls suggests that this constitutes the privileging of a particular (non-political) comprehensive conception of rational advantage or the good.

In replying to this criticism, Sen particularly points to the heterogeneity (variability) in people’s abilities to convert the same bundle of resources into valuable functionings. Theories of justice that focus on the distribution of means implicitly assume that they will provide the same effective freedom to live the life one has reason to value to all, but this excludes relevant information about the relationship between particular people and resources. Even if one abstracts from existing social inequalities or the results of personal choices (‘option luck’), as many liberal theories of justice do, one will still find a substantial and pervasive variation in the abilities of different members of a society to utilize the same resources - whether of specific goods like education or general purpose goods like income. That means that even if it happened that everyone had the same conception of the good, and the same bundle of resources, the fact of heterogeneity would mean that people would have differential real capability to pursue the life they had reason to value. Therefore, Sen argues, a theory of justice based on fairness should be directly and deeply concerned with the effective freedom – capability – of actual people to achieve the lives they have reason to value.

b. Under-Theorisation

Both capability theorists and external critics express concern that the content and structure of Sen’s Capability Approach is under-theorised and this makes it unsuitable as a theory of justice. Sen does not say which capabilities are important or how they are to be distributed: he argues that those are political decisions for the society itself to decide. Many philosophers have argued that without an objectively justified list of valuable capabilities the nature of the life ‘we have reason to want’ is unclear and so it is hard to identify the goal that a just society should be aiming towards, to assess how well a society is doing, or to criticize particular shortfalls. Different capability theorists have taken different approaches to the valuation of capabilities, from procedural accounts to ones based on substantive understandings of human nature. There are related concerns about the institutional structure of the Capability Approach, for example, brought by the Rawlsian social justice theorist, Thomas Pogge (Pogge 2002). How should capabilities be weighted against each other and non-capability concerns? For example, should some basic capabilities be prioritized as more urgent? What does the Capability Approach imply for interpersonal equality? How should capability enhancement be paid for? How much responsibility should individuals take for the results of their own choices? What should be done about non-remediable deprivations, such as blindness?

Sen’s main response to such criticisms has been to admit that the Capability Approach is not a theory of justice but rather an approach to the evaluation of effective freedom.

c. Individualism

Sen’s emphasis on individual effective freedom as the focal concern of the Capability Approach has been criticized as excessively individualistic. There are several components to this family of criticisms. Some communitarians see Sen’s account as lacking interest in, and even sometimes overtly hostile to, communal values and ways of life because of an excessive focus on individuals. Charles Gore, for example, has argued that Sen’s approach only considers states of affairs and social arrangements in terms of how good or bad they are for an individual’s well-being and freedom (Gore 1997). But this excludes consideration of certain other goods which individuals may have reason to value which are ‘irreducibly social’ because they cannot be reduced to properties of individuals, such as a shared language, set of moral norms, or political structure. A related criticism argues that Sen’s emphasis on individual freedom is vague and fails to consider how one individual’s freedom may affect others. Martha Nussbaum, for example, points out that a just society requires balancing and even limiting certain freedoms, such as regarding the expression of racist views, and in order to do so must make commitments about which freedoms are good or bad, important or trivial (Nussbaum 2003).  Others have noted that ‘freedom’ though broad, is a poor way of conceptualizing certain inter-personal goods such as friendship, respect, and care. A third line of critique takes issue with Sen’s ‘thin’ agency based picture of persons as too abstract and rationalistic. It is said to be founded too closely in Sen’s personal dialectical relationship between economics and philosophy, and not enough in the perspectives and methods of anthropology, sociology, or psychology (see, for example, Giri 2000; Gasper 2002). As a result Sen’s account is said to have a poor grasp, for example, of the centrality and complexity of personal growth and development.

With regard to ‘irreducibly social goods’ like culture, Sen argues that they not only enter into the analysis instrumentally (such as in the requirements for appearing in public without shame) but also as part of the lives people have reason to value. Nevertheless Sen is clear in his view that the value of social goods is only derivative upon the reflective choices of those concerned (see, for example, Sen 2004a). So if people on reflection don’t value such social goods as the traditional religious institutions of their society or continuing to speak a minority language then that should trump the ‘right’ of those institutions to continue. With regard to freedom, Sen distinguishes the ability to choose between different options from the value of those options. These two together make up effective freedom or capability. Simple freedom to choose may be vulnerable to the objection that it is compatible with invidious freedoms, but the Capability Approach is concerned with people’s ability to live a life they have reason to value, which incorporates an ethical evaluation of the content of their options. It is not concerned only with increasing people’s freedom-as-power. Finally, Sen’s Capability Approach is particularly concerned with grasping the dimensions of human well-being and advantage missing from standard approaches. This relates to its concern with tracing the causal pathways of specific deprivations, with how exactly different people are able or unable to convert resources into valuable functionings. Although this remains somewhat abstractly presented in the formal structure of the Capability Approach, Sen’s analysis of, for example, adaptive preferences and intra-household distribution do go at least some way to a situated and sociological analysis.

d. Information Gaps

Sen’s Capability Approach is founded on the idea that much more information about the quality of human lives can and should be taken into account in evaluating them. The Human Development Index developed by Amartya Sen and the economist Mahbub ul Haq in 1990 for the United Nations Development Programme's Human Development Reports is the most influential capability metric currently used. However it has been criticized for its crudeness. It contains only three dimensions – longevity, literacy (mean years of schooling), and Gross National Income per capita – which are weighted equally. The Capability Approach is supposed to be interested in assessing how people fare on many dimensions of life including some which seem very difficult to obtain information about, such as people’s real choice sets or such complicated capabilities as the ability to appear in public without shame or to form relationships with others. It also requires detailed information on the real inter-personal variations in translating commodities into functionings. It is not clear however that such informational ambitions could ever be realized. Furthermore even the effort of trying to collect such detailed information about people’s lives and their ‘real’ disabilities can be seen as invasive.

Sen was concerned about the crudeness of the Human Development Index (HDI) from the start, but was won over by Mahbub ul Haq’s argument for the rhetorical significance of a composite index of human well-being that could compete directly with the crude GDP per capita numbers that have been so influential in development thinking. Thus the HDI does not fully reflect the scope or methodology of the Capability Approach. Nevertheless it has succeeded in demonstrating that capability related information can be used systematically as a credible supplement to economic metrics. Sen accepts that some information about capabilities is easier to obtain than others. Firstly, he argues that we already have quite extensive information about some basic capabilities even for many quite poor countries, such as about health, that can and should be systematically assessed. There is therefore no need to limit our assessment to economic metrics which firstly count the wrong things (means) and secondly also come with significant measurement error despite their apparent numerical precision. Secondly, he argues that if researchers accept the capability space as the new priority for evaluation that will motivate the development of new data collection priorities and methods. As a result more information will become available about how people are faring on the currently ‘missing dimensions’ of the lives we have reason to value, for example, relating to employment or gender equality in domestic arrangements. Nevertheless, the Capability Approach is not concerned with information collection for its own sake, but rather with the appropriate use of information for assessment. It is therefore not committed to, nor does its effective use require, building a perfect information collection and assessment bureaucracy.

6. Theorising the Capability Approach

A number of philosophers sympathetic to Sen’s foundational concerns have nevertheless been dissatisfied with the vagueness and under-elaboration of the theoretical structure of his Capability Approach (although these features seem to be quite deliberate on Sen’s part). A number of theoretical accounts have been developed that seek to elaborate the Capability Approach more systematically and to address these philosophers’ particular concerns. Some theoretical accounts are primarily concerned with operationalising the evaluative dimension of the Capability Approach: the assessment of quality of life, well-being and human development. Others focus on developing a capability based ‘Theory of Justice’ in the spirit of its concerns. This section provides a brief outline of some of these.

a. Generating Lists for Empirical Research in the Social Sciences (Ingrid Robeyns)

Ingrid Robeyns argues that attempting to develop a single all-purpose list of capabilities would be incompatible with Sen’s concern with a general framework of evaluation. Instead she proposes a procedural approach to the selection of capabilities for particular purposes, such as the evaluation of gender inequality in terms of capabilities (Robeyns 2003). She claims that valuational procedures that meet her criteria provide epistemic, academic, and political legitimacy for empirically evaluating capability. Her five criteria are:

(1) Explicit formulation. All proposed list elements should be explicit, so they can be discussed and debated.

(2) Methodological justification. The method of generating the list should be made explicit so it can be scrutinized.

(3) Sensitivity to context. The level of abstraction of the list should be appropriate to its purposes, whether for philosophical, legal, political, or social discussion.

(4) Different levels of generality. If the list is intended for empirical application or public policy then it should be drawn up in two distinct stages, first an ideal stage and then a pragmatic one that reflects perhaps temporary feasibility constraints on information and resources.

(5) Exhaustion and non-reduction. The list should include all important elements and those elements should not be reducible to others (though they may overlap).

b. A Participatory Approach to Evaluating Capability Expansion (Sabina Alkire)

Sabina Alkire has developed a philosophically grounded framework for the participatory valuation and evaluation of development projects in terms of capability enhancement (Alkire 2005). This allows her to go beyond standard cost-benefit analyses of development projects in financial terms to investigate which capabilities that the people concerned have reason to value are enhanced and by how much.

Alkire’s approach has 2 stages of evaluation: i) a theoretical one-off stage in which ‘philosophers’ employ practical reason to reflexively identify the basic spheres or categories of value, and ii) a local participatory phase in which members of a social group deliberate, with the aid of a facilitator, about what their needs are and what, and how, they would like to do about them (with the basic categories employed as prompts to ensure that all main dimensions of value are discussed). For the first, philosophical, stage Alkire proposes an adaptation of the practical reasoning approach of John Finnis to identify the basic dimensions of human well-being by asking iteratively, ‘why do I/others do what we do?’ until one comes to recognize the basic reasons for which no further reasoned justification can be given. This method is intended to yield substantive and objective descriptions of the fundamental, non-hierarchically ordered, dimensions of human flourishing, while allowing the content and relative importance of these dimensions to be specified in a participatory process according to a particular group’s historical, cultural, and personal values. The intrinsically important dimensions identified by this method are: Life; Knowledge; Play; Aesthetic experience; Sociability; Practical reasonableness; Religion.

One of the advantages Alkire claims for her approach is its ability to elicit what the people whose lives are the subject of development projects really consider valuable, which may sometimes surprise external planners and observers. Her use of the participatory approach for assessing NGO fieldwork in Pakistan showed, for example, that even the very poor can and do reasonably value other things than material well-being, such as religion and social participation.

c. Justice as Equal Capability of Democratic Citizenship (Elizabeth Anderson)

Elizabeth Anderson has proposed a partial theory of justice based on equal capability of democratic citizenship (Anderson 1999). Anderson takes equality in social relationships as the focus for her egalitarian theory of justice and argues that one should analyze the requirements of such equality in terms of the social conditions supporting it as a capability. Although Anderson’s primary concern is for equality in the particular dimension of democratic citizenship, she suggests that this has extensive egalitarian implications for the nature of the society as a whole, because other capabilities - such as relating to health, education, personal autonomy and self-respect, and economic fairness - are required as supporting conditions to realize truly equal citizenship.  She argues that, “Negatively, people are entitled to whatever capabilities are necessary to enable them to avoid or escape entanglement in oppressive social relationships. Positively, they are entitled to whatever capabilities are necessary for functioning as an equal citizen in a democratic state (Anderson 1999, 317).”

d. Capability as Freedom from Domination (John Alexander)

John Alexander has proposed a capability theory based on a Republican understanding of the importance of freedom as non-domination (Alexander 2008). He argues that the Capability Approach’s concern with people’s ‘real freedom’ sets it outside and against the standard liberal egalitarian theory of justice framework which understands freedom as the absence of constraints. But he argues that the Capability Approach should go further to elaborate this commitment to real freedom in Republican terms. In this perspective it is not only important that one be able to achieve certain functionings, such as mobility, but whether one’s achievement of these are conditional on the favor or goodwill of other people or are independently guaranteed by one’s own rights and powers. Capability is standardly understood as mapping one’s range of choices over valuable functionings regardless of their content. For example, the ability of a physically disabled but socially well-connected person to travel outside whenever she wants by arranging the help of friends, family and voluntary organizations. In addition the Republican perspective requires that her capability for mobility should be independent of context. For example, in the form of a guaranteed legal right to government assistance on demand, or by the provision of her own specially adapted self-drive vehicle. Otherwise she may be said to be still deprived since her capability is not completely free.

Domination should also be integrated into capability evaluation because it will often be a cause of capability deprivation. It is no coincidence that the people who are most capability deprived are often the poorest and weakest in society, and as a result also vulnerable to yet further exploitation. This emphasis on freedom from domination also gives a strong normative orientation to the Capability Approach’s evaluation of the causes of capability failure: some causes are simply unacceptable, such as social norms restricting women’s freedom of movement and employment, and should be removed rather than mitigated.

7. Martha Nussbaum’s Capability Theory of Justice

This section outlines Martha Nussbaum’s work on the Capability Approach: its structure, criticisms, and relationship to Amartya Sen’s work.

a. Structure and Development of Nussbaum’s Capability Theory

Martha Nussbaum has developed the most systematic, extensive, and influential capability theory of justice to date. Nussbaum aims to provide a partial theory of justice (one that doesn’t exhaust the requirements of justice) based on dignity, a list of fundamental capabilities, and a threshold.

Nussbaum’s list of The Central Human Capabilities (Reproduced from Creating Capabilities 2011, 33-4)

1. Life. Being able to live to the end of a human life of normal length; not dying prematurely, or before one’s life is so reduced as to be not worth living.

2. Bodily Health. Being able to have good health, including reproductive health; to be adequately nourished; to have adequate shelter.

3. Bodily Integrity. Being able to move freely from place to place; to be secure against violent assault, including sexual assault and domestic violence; having opportunities for sexual satisfaction and for choice in matters of reproduction.

4. Senses, Imagination, and Thought. Being able to use the senses, to imagine, think, and reason – and to do these things in a ‘‘truly human’’ way, a way informed and cultivated by an adequate education, including, but by no means limited to, literacy and basic mathematical and scientific training. Being able to use imagination and thought in connection with experiencing and producing works and events of one’s own choice, religious, literary, musical, and so forth. Being able to use one’s mind in ways protected by guarantees of freedom of expression with respect to both political and artistic speech, and freedom of religious exercise. Being able to have pleasurable experiences and to avoid non-beneficial pain.

5. Emotions. Being able to have attachments to things and people outside ourselves; to love those who love and care for us, to grieve at their absence; in general, to love, to grieve, to experience longing, gratitude, and justified anger. Not having one’s emotional development blighted by fear and anxiety. (Supporting this capability means supporting forms of human association that can be shown to be crucial in their development.)

6. Practical Reason. Being able to form a conception of the good and to engage in critical reflection about the planning of one’s life. (This entails protection for the liberty of conscience and religious observance.)

7. Affiliation.

A. Being able to live with and toward others, to recognize and show concern for other human beings, to engage in various forms of social interaction; to be able to imagine the situation of another. (Protecting this capability means protecting institutions that constitute and nourish such forms of affiliation, and also protecting the freedom of assembly and political speech.)

B. Having the social bases of self-respect and nonhumiliation; being able to be treated as a dignified being whose worth is equal to that of others. This entails provisions of nondiscrimination on the basis of race, sex, sexual orientation, ethnicity, caste, religion, national origin.

8. Other Species. Being able to live with concern for and in relation to animals, plants, and the world of nature.

9. Play. Being able to laugh, to play, to enjoy recreational activities.

10. Control Over One’s Environment.

A. Political. Being able to participate effectively in political choices that govern one’s life; having the right of political participation, protections of free speech and association.

B. Material. Being able to hold property (both land and movable goods), and having property rights on an equal basis with others; having the right to seek employment on an equal basis with others; having the freedom from unwarranted search and seizure. In work, being able to work as a human being, exercising practical reason, and entering into meaningful relationships of mutual recognition with other workers.

In her early contributions to the capability approach, Nussbaum justified the composition of her list by explicitly Aristotelian argument about the perfectionist requirements of the truly human life (Nussbaum 1988). In the mid-1990s however she converted the structure of her account to a Rawlsian style ‘politically liberal’ account. This means that she now presents her list as a proposal that is neutral with respect to particular conceptions of the good, but can be endorsed by many different groups in a society through an overlapping consensus. However the list components themselves remain almost identical and retain a distinctively Aristotelian cast.

Nussbaum’s account is motivated by a concept of human dignity (in contrast to Sen’s emphasis on freedom), which she links to flourishing in the Aristotelian sense. She argues that her list of 10 fundamental capabilities follow from the requirements of dignity and have been tested and adapted over the course of an extensive cross-cultural dialogue she has carried out, particularly in India (as related in her book, Women and Human Development, 2001). The threshold is a 'sufficientarian' principle that specifies the minimum requirements of justice: everyone must be entitled to each capability at least to this degree by their governments and relevant international institutions. Access to these capabilities is required by human dignity, Nussbaum argues, but this does not mean that a life lacking in any of these, whether from external deprivation or individual choice, is a less than human life. Choice and deprivation are different however. If someone lacks access to these capabilities, for example, to be well-nourished (bodily health), that reflects a failure by society to respect her human dignity. If someone chooses not to take up her opportunities to certain capabilities, for example, to adopt an ascetic life-style and fast for religious reasons at the expense of her bodily health, respecting that choice is also an aspect of respecting her dignity.

Nussbaum suggests that her list, together with the precise location of the threshold, should be democratically debated and incorporated into national constitutional guarantees, international human rights legislation and international development policy. In keeping with its commitment to political liberalism, the components of Nussbaum’s list have a ‘thick-vague’ character in that while they have a universal claim to be of central importance to any human life, their definition is vague enough to allow their specification in multiple ways that reflect the values, histories, and special circumstances of particular political societies. For example, freedom of speech may be defined differently in law in the USA and Germany, because of their different histories, without endangering the fundamental capability. Nevertheless, because each capability is equally centrally important and a shortfall in any area is significant in itself, the scope for governments to make trade-offs between them, for example, on the basis of quantitative cost-benefit analysis, is limited.

b. Criticisms of Nussbaum’s Theory

Nussbaum’s capability theory of justice received quite intense criticism. Some have questioned the epistemological basis of her approach, finding it rather suspicious that after all her years of cross-cultural discussion her list remains basically the same rather ‘intellectualized’ Aristotelian one she had suggested in the first place (Okin 2003), and suggest that it rather reflects the values of a typical 21st century American liberal than a set of timeless universal values or a contemporary global overlapping consensus (Stewart 2001). Others have argued that her legal-moral-philosophical orientation is elitist and over-optimistic about what constitutions and governments are like and are capable of (Menon 2002); is over-specified and paternalistic yet still misses out important capabilities and is inappropriate for many uses, such as quality of life measurement or development fieldwork (Alkire 2005, 35-45).

In response to such criticisms, Nussbaum has defended the contents of her list as having cross-cultural credibility, but also emphasised that she is not trying to impose a definitive capability theory on everyone. She makes a clear and explicit distinction between the dimensions of justification (why her theory is best) and implementation (its more humble meta-status as an object for democratic deliberation and decision by those concerned) (Nussbaum 2004).

c. Sen and Nussbaum

Nussbaum and Sen collaborated in the late 1980s and early 1990s and since they are the most high-profile writers in the Capability Approach their accounts are often elided, despite significant differences. When they are distinguished, Nussbaum’s account is often seen as the more ‘philosophical’ because she has developed the Capability Approach in a more orthodox philosophical way, for example, by focusing on theoretical rigor, coherence and completeness. As a result, Sen’s approach is sometimes perceived merely as a predecessor to Nussbaum’s more developed second generation account, and therefore of primarily historical interest to understanding the Capability Approach rather than a parallel account in its own right.

The accounts of Sen and Nussbaum differ significantly in ways that relate to their different concerns and backgrounds. In particular:

  • Nussbaum is concerned to produce a philosophically coherent normative (partial) theory of justice; Sen is concerned with producing a general framework for evaluating the quality of lives people can lead that can incorporate the very diverse concerns and dimensions that may be applicable.
  • While Sen’s approach is founded on enhancing individual freedom, Nussbaum’s theory is founded on respecting human dignity.
  • Sen’s comprehensive consequentialism makes room for incorporating empirical information about feasibility and instrumental relationships between capabilities when considering policies; Nussbaum largely rejects such instrumental analysis because she is wary of its ‘Utilitarian associations’.
  • Sen’s Capability Approach in its normative ‘developmental’ aspect, is mainly concerned with practical incremental improvements; Nussbaum’s approach is rather more utopian in that it demands the full implementation of minimal justice (achievement of the minimum thresholds of all fundamental capabilities) for all, and this is specified so demandingly that no country yet meets it (though she has suggested that Finland may be close).

8. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • John M. Alexander 2008. Capabilities and Social Justice. Ashgate Publishing, Ltd.
    • Introduction to the Capability Approach, with attention to Sen’s, Nussbaum’s, and Anderson’s accounts and a development of his own Republican account in the final chapter.
  • Sabina Alkire. 2005. Valuing Freedoms. Oxford University Press.
    • First half of the book develops a procedure for operationalizing the Capability Approach for participatory development; second half applies this to the evaluation of development projects.
  • Elizabeth Anderson. 1999. “What Is the Point of Equality?” Ethics 109 (2): 287-337.
    • Critique of luck egalitarianism and outline of a capability theory of justice based on the capability for equal democratic citizenship.
  • Martha Nussbaum. 1988. Nature, Function, and Capability: Aristotle on Political Distribution. In Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy. Oxford University Press.
    • Martha Nussbaum’s first contribution to the capability approach, based on a reading of Aristotle’s politics and ethics.
  • Martha Nussbaum. 2001. Women and Human Development (Cambridge University Press,).
    • Key text in Nussbaum’s second stage - political – development of a capability theory of justice.
  • Martha Nussbaum. 2004. “On Hearing Women’s Voices: A Reply to Susan Okin.” Philosophy and Public Affairs 32 (2): 193-205.
    • Nussbaum replies to criticisms of the methodology and legitimacy of her list.
  • Martha Nussbaum. 2011. Creating Capabilities: The Human Development Approach (Harvard University Press).
    • Non-technical introduction to the capability approach and Nussbaum’s capability theory of justice intended for university undergraduates.
  • Ingrid Robeyns. 2003. “Sen’s Capability Approach and Gender Inequality: selecting relevant capabilities.” Feminist Economics 9 (2): 61-92.
    • Robeyns outlines her procedure for choosing capabilities and applies it to the case of gender equality.
  • Amartya Sen. 1979. Equality of What? Stanford University: Tanner Lectures on Human Values (Available from the Tanner Lectures website)
    • Amartya Sen’s first publication on the capability approach, particularly focused on criticizing utilitarian and Rawlsian perspectives on well-being.
  • Amartya Sen. 1985. Commodities and Capabilities. North-Holland.
    • The most formal (technical) elaboration of Sen’s capability approach.
  • Amartya Sen. 1989. “Development as Capability Expansion,” Journal of Development Planning 19: 41–58.
    • An especially accessible and succinct account of the capability approach to human development.
  • Amartya Sen. 1999. Development as Freedom. Oxford University Press.
    • Important and influential synthesis of Sen’s work on human development and the Capability Approach.
  • Amartya Sen. 2004a. UN Human Development Report 2004: Chapter 1 Cultural Liberty and Human Development. UN Human Development Reports. United Nations Development Programme. (Available from the UNDP website).
    • Strong argument by Sen that cultural rights should be derivative upon individuals’ freedom to choose.
  • Amartya Sen. 2004b. “Capabilities, Lists, and Public Reason: Continuing the Conversation,” Feminist Economics 10, no. 3: 77-80.
    • An interview with Amartya Sen in which he elaborates on his rejection of a fixed list of capabilities (frequently cited).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Des Gasper. 2002. “Is Sen’s Capability Approach an Adequate Basis for Considering Human Development?” Review of Political Economy 14 (4): 435-461.
    • Thorough analysis of Sen’s account, including a critique of its excessive abstraction.
  • Ananta Kumar Giri. 2000. “Rethinking Human Well-being: A Dialogue with Amartya Sen.” Journal of International Development 12 (7): 1003-1018.
    • Critique of Sen’s neglect of personal development.
  • Charles Gore. 1997. “Irreducibly Social Goods and the Informational Basis of Amartya Sen’s Capability Approach.” Journal of International Development 9 (2): 235-250.
    • Critique of Sen’s neglect of social values.
  • Susan Moller Okin. 2003. “Poverty, Well-Being, and Gender: What Counts, Who’s Heard?” Philosophy and Public Affairs 31 (3): 280-316.
    • Feminist critique of Nussbaum’s theory
  • Nivedita Menon. 2002. “Universalism without Foundations?” Economy and Society 31 (1): 152.
    • Critique of the political philosophy in Nussbaum’s theory.
  • Martha Nussbaum. 2003. “Capabilities as Fundamental Entitlements: Sen and Social Justice.” Feminist Economics 9 (2): 33.
    • Critique of Sen’s Capability Approach as too vaguely specified to support normative judgments.
  • Thomas Pogge. 2002. “Can the Capability Approach Be Justified?” Philosophical Topics 30 (2): 167–228.
    • Important Rawlsian critique of Sen’s account, frequently cited.
  • Frances Stewart. 2001. Book Review “Women and Human Development: The Capabilities Approach, by Martha Nussbaum” Journal of International Development 13 (8): 1191-1192.
    • Short but powerful critique of Nussbaum’s capability theory from a leading human development scholar.


Author Information

Thomas Wells
Erasmus University Rotterdam
The Netherlands

German Idealism

German idealism is the name of a movement in German philosophy that began in the 1780s and lasted until the 1840s. The most famous representatives of this movement are Kant, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel. While there are important differences between these figures, they all share a commitment to idealism. Kant’s transcendental idealism was a modest philosophical doctrine about the difference between appearances and things in themselves, which claimed that the objects of human cognition are appearances and not things in themselves. Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel radicalized this view, transforming Kant’s transcendental idealism into absolute idealism, which holds that things in themselves are a contradiction in terms, because a thing must be an object of our consciousness if it is to be an object at all.

German idealism is remarkable for its systematic treatment of all the major parts of philosophy, including logic, metaphysics and epistemology, moral and political philosophy, and aesthetics.  All of the representatives of German idealism thought these parts of philosophy would find a place in a general system of philosophy. Kant thought this system could be derived from a small set of interdependent principles. Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel were, again, more radical. Inspired by Karl Leonhard Reinhold, they attempted to derive all the different parts of philosophy from a single, first principle. This first principle came to be known as the absolute, because the absolute, or unconditional, must precede all the principles which are conditioned by the difference between one principle and another.

Although German idealism is closely related to developments in the intellectual history of Germany in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, such as classicism and romanticism, it is also closely related to larger developments in the history of modern philosophy. Kant, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel sought to overcome the division between rationalism and empiricism that had emerged during the early modern period. The way they characterized these tendencies has exerted a lasting influence on the historiography of modern philosophy. Although German idealism itself has been subject to periods of neglect in the last two hundred years, renewed interest in the contributions of the German idealism have made it an important resource for contemporary philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
  2. Logic
  3. Metaphysics and Epistemology
  4. Moral and Political Philosophy
  5. Aesthetics
  6. Reception and Influence
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Kant
      1. German Editions of Kant’s Works
      2. Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant in Translation
      3. Other English Translations of Kant’s Works
    2. Fichte
      1. German Editions of Fichte’s Works
      2. English Translations of Fichte’s Works
    3. Hegel
      1. German Editions of Hegel’s Works
      2. English Translations of Hegel’s Works
        1. Cambridge Hegel Translations
        2. Other English Translations of Hegel’s Works
    4. Schelling
      1. German Editions of Schelling’s Works
      2. English Translations of Schelling’s Works
    5. Editions and Translations of Other Primary Sources
      1. Jacobi
      2. Reinhold
      3. Hölderlin
      4. Kierkegaard, Søren
      5. Marx
      6. Schopenhauer
    6. Other Works on German Idealism

1. Historical Background


German idealism can be traced back to the “critical” or “transcendental” idealism of Immanuel Kant (1724-1804). Kant’s idealism first came to prominence during the pantheism controversy in 1785-1786. When the controversy arose, Kant had already published the first (A) edition of the Critique of Pure Reason (1781) and the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783). Both works had their admirers, but they received unsympathetic and generally uncomprehending reviews, conflating Kant’s “transcendental” idealism with Berkeley’s “dogmatic” idealism (Allison and Heath 2002, 160-166). Thus, Kant was taken to hold that space and time are “not actual” and that the understanding “makes” the objects of our cognition (Sassen 2000, 53-54).

Kant insisted that this reading misrepresented his position. While the dogmatic idealist denies the reality of space and time, Kant takes space and time to be forms of intuition. Forms of intuition are, for Kant, the subjective conditions of the possibility of all of our sense perception. It is only because space and time are a priori forms that determine the content of our sensations that Kant thinks we can perceive anything at all. According to Kant, “critical” or “transcendental” idealism serves merely to identify those a priori conditions, like space and time, that make experience possible. It certainly does not imply that space and time are unreal or that the understanding produces the objects of our cognition by itself.

Kant hoped to enlist the support of famous German philosophers like Moses Mendelssohn (1729-1786), Johan Nicolai Tetens (1738-1807), and Christian Garve (1742-1798) in order to refute the “dogmatic” idealist interpretation of his philosophy and win a more favorable hearing for his work. Unfortunately, the endorsements Kant hoped for never arrived. Mendelssohn, in particular, was preoccupied with concerns about his health and the dispute that had arisen between himself and Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi (1743-1819) about the alleged Spinozism of his friend Gotthold Ephraim Lessing (1729-1781). This dispute came to be known as the pantheism controversy, because of Spinoza’s famous equivocation between God and nature.

During the controversy, Jacobi charged that any attempt to demonstrate philosophical truths was fatally flawed. Jacobi pointed to Spinoza as the chief representative of the tendency toward demonstrative reason in philosophy, but he also drew parallels between Spinozism and Kant’s transcendental idealism throughout On the Doctrine of Spinoza (1785). In 1787, the same year Kant published the second (B) edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, Jacobi published David Hume on Faith or Realism and Idealism, which included a supplement On Transcendental Idealism. Jacobi concluded that transcendental idealism, like Spinozism, subordinates the immediate certainty, or faith, through which we know the world, to demonstrative reason, transforming reality into an illusion. Jacobi later called this “nihilism.”

Kant’s views were defended by Karl Leonhard Reinhold (1757-1823) during the pantheism controversy. Reinhold thought Kant’s philosophy could refute skepticism and nihilism and provide a defense of morality and religion which was not to be found in the rationalism of the Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy. The publication of Reinhold’s Letters on the Kantian Philosophy, first in Der Teutsche Merkur in 1786-1787 and then again in an enlarged version in 1790-1792, helped make Kant’s philosophy one of the most influential, and most controversial, philosophies of the period. Jacobi remained a thorn in the side of the Kantians and the young German idealists, but he was unable to staunch interest in philosophy in general or idealism in particular.

In 1787, Reinhold assumed a position at the university in Jena, where he taught Kant’s philosophy and began developing his own ideas. While Reinhold’s thought continued to be influenced by Kant, he also came to believe that Kant had failed to provide philosophy with a solid foundation. According to Reinhold, Kant was a philosophical genius, but he did not have the “genius of system” that would allow him to properly order his discoveries. Reinhold’s Elementarphilosophie (Elementary Philosophy/Philosophy of Elements), laid out in his Essay Towards a New Theory of the Faculty of Representation (1789), Contribution to the Correction of the Previous Misunderstandings of the Philosophers (1790), and On the Foundation of Philosophical Knowledge (1791), was intended to address this shortcoming and show that Kant’s philosophy could be derived from a single foundational principle. Reinhold called this principle “the principle of consciousness” and states that “in consciousness, representation is distinguished by the subject from subject and object and is referred to both.” With this principle, Reinhold thought he could explain what is fundamental to all cognition, namely, that 1) cognition is essentially the conscious representation of an object by a subject and 2) that representations refer to both the subject and object of cognition.

When Reinhold left Jena for a new position in Kiel in 1794, his chair was given to Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814), who quickly radicalized Kant’s idealism and Reinhold’s attempts to systematize philosophy. In response to a skeptical challenge to Reinhold’s Elementarphilosophie, raised anonymously by Gottlob Ernst Schulze (1761-1833) in his work Aenesidemus (1792), Fichte asserted that the principle of representation was not, as Reinhold had maintained, a fact (Tatsache) of consciousness, but rather an act (Tathandlung) whereby consciousness produces the distinction between subject and object by positing the distinction between the I and not-I (Breazeale, 1988, 64). This insight became the foundation of Fichte’s Wissenschaftslehre (Doctrine of Science/Doctrine of Scientific Knowledge) which was first published in 1794. It was soon followed by Fichte’s Foundations of Natural Right (1797) and the System of Ethics (1798). In later years, Fichte presented a number of substantially different versions of the Wissenschaftslehre in lectures in Berlin.

When, as a result of a controversy concerning his religious views, Fichte left Jena in 1799, Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling (1775-1854) became the most important idealist in Jena. Schelling had arrived in Jena in 1798, when he was only 23 years old, but he was already an enthusiastic proponent of Fichte’s philosophy, which he defended in early works like On the I as Principle of Philosophy (1795). Schelling had also established close relationships with the Jena romantics, who, despite their great interest in Kant, Reinhold, and Fichte, maintained a more skeptical attitude towards philosophy than the German idealists. Although Schelling did not share the romantics’ reservations about idealism, the proximity between Schelling and the romantics is evident in Schelling’s writings on the philosophy of nature and the philosophy of art, which he presented in his Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature (1797), System of Transcendental Idealism (1800), and Philosophy of Art (1802-1803).

Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel (1770-1831) had been Schelling’s classmate in Tübingen from 1790-1793. Along with the poet Friedrich Hölderlin (1770-1843), the two had collaborated on The Oldest Program for a System of German Idealism (1796). After following Schelling to Jena in 1801, Hegel published his first independent contributions to German idealism, The Difference Between Fichte’s and Schelling’s System of Philosophy (1801), in which he distinguishes Fichte’s “subjective” idealism from Schelling’s “objective” or “absolute” idealism. Hegel’s work documented the growing rift between Fichte and Schelling. This rift was to expand following Hegel’s falling-out with Schelling in 1807, when Hegel published his monumental Phenomenology of Spirit (1807). Although Hegel only published three more books during his lifetime, Science of Logic (1812-1816), Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences (1817-1830), and Elements of the Philosophy of Right (1821), he remains the most widely-read and most influential of the German idealists.

2. Logic

The German idealists have acquired a reputation for obscurity, because of the length and complexity of many of their works. As a consequence, they are often considered to be obscurantists and irrationalists. The German idealists were, however, neither obscurantists nor irrationalists. Their contributions to logic are earnest attempts to formulate a modern logic that is consistent with the idealism of their metaphysics and epistemology.

Kant was the first of the German idealists to make important contributions to logic. In the Preface to the second (B) edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant argues that logic has nothing to do with metaphysics, psychology, or anthropology, because logic is “the science that exhaustively presents and strictly proves nothing but the formal rules of all thinking” (Guyer and Wood 1998, 106-107/Bviii-Bix). Kant came to refer to this purely formal logic as “general” logic, which is to be contrasted with the “Transcendental Logic” that he develops in the second part of the “Transcendental Doctrine of Elements” in the Critique of Pure Reason. Transcendental logic differs from general logic because, like the principles of a priori sensibility that Kant presents in the “Transcendental Aesthetic” of the Critique of Pure Reason, transcendental logic is part of metaphysics. Transcendental logic also differs from general logic because it does not abstract from the content of cognition. Transcendental logic contains the laws of pure thinking as they pertain to the cognition of objects. This does not mean that transcendental logic is concerned with empirical objects as such, but rather with the a priori conditions of the possibility of the cognition of objects. Kant’s famous “Transcendental Deduction of the Pure Concepts of the Understanding” is meant to demonstrate that the concepts the transcendental logic presents as the a priori conditions of the possibility of the cognition of objects do, in fact, make the cognition of objects possible and are necessary conditions for any and all cognition of objects.

In The Foundation of Philosophical Knowledge, Reinhold objects that Kant’s transcendental logic presupposed general logic, because transcendental logic is a “particular” logic from which general logic, or “logic proper, without surnames,” cannot be derived. Reinhold insisted that the laws of general logic had to be derived from the principle of consciousness if philosophy was to become systematic and scientific, but the possibility of this derivation was contested by Schulze in Aenesidemus. Schulze’s critique of Reinhold’s Elementarphilosophie focuses on the priority Reinhold attributes to the principle of consciousness. Because the principle of consciousness has to be consistent with basic logical principles like the principle of non-contradiction and the principle of the excluded middle, Schulze concluded that it could not be regarded as a first principle. The laws of general logic were, it seemed, prior to the principle of consciousness, so that even the Elementarphilosophie presupposed general logic.

Fichte accepted many aspects of Schulze’s critique of Reinhold, but, like Reinhold, he thought it was crucial to demonstrate that the laws of logic could be derived from "real philosophy” or “metaphysics.” In his Personal Meditations on the Elementarphilosophie (1792-1793), his essay Concerning the Concept of the Wissenschaftslehre (1794), and then again in the Wissenschaftslehre of 1794, Fichte argued that the act that posits the distinction between the I and not-I determines consciousness in a way that makes logical analysis possible. Logical analysis is always undertaken reflectively, according to Fichte, because it presupposes that consciousness has already been determined in some way. So, while Kant maintains that transcendental logic presupposes general logic, Reinhold attempts to derive the laws of general logic from the principle of consciousness, and Schulze shows Reinhold to presuppose the same principles, Fichte forcefully asserts that logic presupposes the determination of thought “as a fact of consciousness,” which itself depends upon the act through which consciousness is originally determined.

Hegel’s contributions to logic have been far more influential than those of Reinhold or Fichte. His Science of Logic (also known as the “Greater Logic”) and the Logic that constitutes the first part of the Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences (also known as the “Lesser Logic”) are not contributions to earlier debates about the priority of general logic. Nor do they accept that what Kant called “general” logic and Reinhold called “logic proper, without surnames” is purely formal logic. Because Hegel was convinced that truth is both formal and material, and not one or the other, he sought to establish the dialectical unity of the formal and the material in his works on logic. The meaning of the word “dialectical” is, of course, much debated, as is the specific mechanism through which the dialectic produces and resolves the contradictions that move thought from one form of consciousness to another. For Hegel, however, this process accounts for the genesis of the categories and concepts through which all cognition is determined. Logic reveals the unity of that process.

German idealism’s contributions to logic were largely dismissed following the rise of empiricism and positivism in the nineteenth century, as well as the revolutions in logic that took place at the beginning of the twentieth century. Today, however, there is a renewed interest in this part of the idealist tradition, as is evident in the attention which has been paid to Kant’s lectures on logic and the new editions and translations of Hegel’s writings and lectures on logic.

3. Metaphysics and Epistemology

German idealism is a form of idealism. The idealism espoused by the German idealists is, however, different from other kinds of idealism with which contemporary philosophers may be more familiar. While earlier idealists maintained that reality is ultimately intellectual rather than material (Plato) or that the existence of objects is mind-dependent (Berkeley), the German idealists reject the distinctions these views presuppose. In addition to the distinction between the material and the formal and the distinction between the real and the ideal, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel also reject the distinction between being and thinking, further complicating the German idealists’ views on metaphysics and epistemology.

Kant’s idealism is, perhaps, the most moderate form of idealism associated with German idealism. Kant holds that the objects of human cognition are transcendentally ideal and empirically real. They are transcendentally ideal, because the conditions of the cognition human beings have of objects are to be found in the cognitive faculties of human beings. This does not mean the existence of those objects is mind-dependent, because Kant thinks we can only know objects to the extent that they are objects for us and, thus, as they appear to us. Idealism with respect to appearances does not entail the mind-dependence of objects, because it does not commit itself to any claims about the nature of things in themselves. Kant denies that we have any knowledge of things in themselves, because we do not have the capacity to make judgments about the nature of things in themselves based on our knowledge of things as they appear.

Despite our ignorance of things in themselves, Kant thought we could have objectively valid cognition of empirically real objects. Kant recognized that we are affected by things outside ourselves and that this affection produces sensations. These sensations are, for Kant, the “matter” of sensible intuition. Along with the pure “forms” of intuition, space and time, sensations constitute the “matter” of judgment. The pure concepts of the understanding are the “forms” of judgment, which Kant demonstrates to be the conditions of the possibility of objectively valid cognition in the “Deduction of the Pure Concepts of the Understanding” in the Critique of Pure Reason. The synthesis of matter and form in judgment therefore produces objectively valid cognition of empirically real objects

To say that the idealism of Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel is more radical than Kant’s idealism is to understate the difference between Kant and the philosophers he inspired. Kant proposed a “modest” idealism, which attempted to prove that our knowledge of appearances is objectively valid. Fichte, however, maintains the very idea of a thing in itself, a thing which is not an object for us and which exists independently of our consciousness, is a contradiction in terms. There can be no thing in itself, Fichte claims, because a thing is only a thing when it is something for us. Even the thing in itself is, in fact, a product of our own conscious thought, meaning the thing in itself is nothing other a postulation of our own consciousness. Thus, it is not a thing in itself, but just another object for us.  From this line of reasoning, Fichte concludes that “everything which occurs in our mind can be completely explained and comprehended on the basis of the mind itself” (Breazeale 1988, 69). This is a much more radical form of idealism than Kant maintained. For Fichte holds that consciousness is a circle in which the I posits itself and determines what belongs to the I and what belongs to the not-I. This circularity is necessary and unavoidable, Fichte maintains, but philosophy is a reflective activity in which the spontaneous positing activity of the I and the determinations of the I and not-I are comprehended.

Schelling defended Fichte’s idealism in On the I as Principle of Philosophy, where he maintained that the I is the unconditioned condition of both being and thinking. Because the existence of the I precedes all thinking (I must exist in order to think) and because thinking determines all being (A thing is nothing other than an object of thought), Schelling argued, the absolute I, not Reinhold’s principle of consciousness, must be the fundamental principle of all philosophy. In subsequent works like the System of Transcendental Idealism, however, Schelling pursued a different course, arguing that the essential and primordial unity of being and thinking can be understood from two different directions, beginning either with nature or spirit. It could be deduced from the absolute I as Fichte had done, but it could also arise from the unconscious but dynamic powers of nature. By showing how these two different approaches complemented one another, Schelling thought he had shown how the distinction between being and thinking, nature and spirit, could be overcome.

Fichte was not pleased with the innovations of Schelling’s idealism, because he initially thought of Schelling as a disciple and a defender of his own position. Fichte did not initially respond to Schelling’s works, but, in an exchange that began in 1800, he began to argue that Schelling had confused the real and the ideal, making the I, the ideal, dependent upon nature, the real. Fichte thought this violated the principles of transcendental idealism and his own Wissenschaftslehre, leading him to suspect that Schelling was no longer the disciple he took him to be. Intervening on Schelling’s behalf as the dispute became more heated, Hegel argued that Fichte’s idealism was “subjective” idealism, while Schelling’s idealism was “objective” idealism. This means that Fichte considers the I to be the absolute and denies the identity of the I and the not-I. He privileges the subject at the expense of the identity of subject and object. Schelling, however, attempts to establish the identity of the subject and object by establishing the objectivity of the subject, the I, as well as the subjectivity of the object, nature. The idealism Schelling and Hegel defend recognizes the identity of subject and object as the “absolute,” unconditioned first principle of philosophy. For that reason, it is often called the philosophy of identity.

It is clear that by the time he published the Phenomenology of Spirit, Hegel was no longer interested in defending Schelling’s system. In the Phenomenology, Hegel famously calls Schelling’s understanding of the identity of subject and object “the night in which all cows are black,” meaning that Schelling’s conception of the identity of subject and object erases the many and varied distinctions which determine the different forms of consciousness. These distinctions are crucial for Hegel, who came to believe that the absolute can only be realized by passing through the different forms of consciousness which are comprehended in the self-consciousness of absolute knowledge or spirit (Geist).

Contemporary scholars like Robert Pippin and Robert Stern have debated whether Hegel’s position is to be regarded as a metaphysical or merely epistemological form of idealism, because it is not entirely clear whether Hegel regarded the distinctions that constitute the different forms of consciousness as merely the conditions necessary for understanding objects (Pippin) or whether they express fundamental commitments about the way things are (Stern). However, it is almost certainly true that Hegel’s idealism is both epistemological and metaphysical. Like Fichte and Schelling, Hegel sought to overcome the limits Kant’s transcendental idealism had placed on philosophy, in order to complete the idealist revolution he had begun. The German idealists agreed that this could only be done by tracing all the different parts of philosophy back to a single principle, whether that principle is the I (in Fichte and the early Schelling) or the absolute (in Hegel).

4. Moral and Political Philosophy

The moral and political philosophy of the German idealists is perhaps the most influential part of their legacy, but it is also one of the most controversial. Many appreciate the emphasis Kant placed on freedom and autonomy in both morality and politics; yet they reject Kant’s moral and political philosophy for its formalism. Fichte’s moral and political philosophy has only recently been studied in detail, but his popular and polemical writings have led some to see him as an extreme nationalist and, perhaps, a precursor to fascism. Hegel is, by some accounts, an apologist for the totalitarian “absolute state.” In what follows, a more even-handed assessment of their views and their merits is developed.

Kantian moral philosophy has been an important part of moral theory since the nineteenth century. Today, it is commonly associated with deontological moral theories, which emphasize duty and obligation, as well as constructivism, which is concerned with the procedures through which moral norms are constructed. Supporters of both approaches frequently refer to the categorical imperative and the different formulations of that imperative which are to be found in Kant’s Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785) and the Critique of Practical Reason (1788). They often take the categorical imperative, or one of its formulations, as a general definition of the right or the good.

The categorical imperative served a slightly different purpose for Kant. In the Groundwork, Kant uses the categorical imperative to define the form of the good will. Kant thought moral philosophy was primarily concerned with the determination of the will. The categorical imperative shows that, in order to be good, the will must be determined according to a rule that is both universal and necessary. Any violation of this rule would result in a contradiction and, therefore, moral impossibility. The categorical imperative provides Kant with a valid procedure and a universal and necessary determination of what is morally obligatory.

Yet in order to determine the will, Kant thought human beings had to be free.  Because freedom cannot be proven in theoretical philosophy, however, Kant says that reason forces us to recognize the concept of freedom as a “fact” of pure practical reason. Kant thinks freedom is necessary for any practical philosophy, because the moral worth and merit of human beings depends on the way they determine their own wills. Without freedom, they would not be able to determine their own wills to the good and we could not hold them responsible for their actions. Thus freedom and autonomy are absolutely crucial for Kant’s understanding of moral philosophy. The political significance of autonomy becomes apparent in some of Kant’s late essays, where he supports a republican politics of freedom, equality, and the rule of law.

Kant’s moral philosophy affected Fichte profoundly, especially the Critique of Practical Reason. “I have been living in a new world ever since reading the Critique of Practical Reason,” Fichte reports, “propositions which I thought could never be overturned have been overturned for me. Things have been proven to me which I thought could never be proven, e.g., the concept of absolute freedom, the concept of duty, etc., and I feel all the happier for it” (Breazeale 1988, 357). His passion for Kant’s moral philosophy can be seen in the Aenesidemus review, where Fichte defends the “primacy” of practical reason over theoretical reason, which he takes to be the foundation of Kant’s “moral theology.”

Despite his admiration for Kant’s moral philosophy, Fichte thought he could go beyond Kant’s formalism. In his essay Concerning the Concept of Wissenschaftslehre, Fichte describes the second, practical part of his plan for Wissenschaftslehre, in which “new and thoroughly elaborated theories of the pleasant, the beautiful, the sublime, the free obedience of nature to its own laws, God, so-called common sense or the natural sense of truth” are laid out, but which also contains “new theories of natural law and morality, the principles of which are material as well as formal” (Breazeale 1988, 135). Unlike Kant, in other words, Fichte would not simply determine the form of the good will, but the ways in which moral and political principles are applied in action.

Fichte's interest in the material principles of moral and political philosophy can be seen in his Foundations of Natural Right and System of Ethics. In both works, Fichte emphasizes the applicability of moral and political principles to action. But he also emphasizes the social context in which these principles are applied. While the I posits itself as well as the not-I, Fichte thinks the I must posit itself as an individual among other individuals, if it is to posit itself “as a rational being with self-consciousness.” The presence of others checks the freedom of the I, because the principles of morality and natural right both require that individual freedom cannot interfere with the freedom of other individuals. Thus the freedom of the I and the relations between individuals and members of the community are governed by the principles of morality and right, which may be applied to all their actions and interactions.

Hegel was also concerned about the formalism of Kant’s moral philosophy, but Hegel approached the problem in a slightly different way than Fichte. In the Phenomenology of Spirit, Hegel describes the breakdown of the “ethical life” (Sittlichkeit) of the community. Hegel understands ethical life as the original unity of social life. While he thinks the unity of ethical life precedes any understanding of the community as a free association of individuals, Hegel also thinks the unity of ethical life is destined to break down. As members of the community become conscious of themselves as individuals, through the conflicts that arise between family and city and between religious law and civil law, ethical life becomes more and more fragmented and the ties that bind the community become less and less immediate. This process is illustrated, in the Phenomenology, by Hegel’s famous – if elliptical – retelling of Sophocles’ Antigone.

Hegel provides a different account of ethical life in the Foundations of the Philosophy of Right. In this work, he contrasts ethical life with morality and abstract right. Abstract right is the name Hegel gives to the idea that individuals are the sole bearers of right. The problem with this view is that it abstracts right from the social and political context in which individuals exercise their rights and realize their freedom. Morality differs from abstract right, because morality recognizes the good as something universal rather than particular. Morality recognizes the “common good” of the community as something that transcends the individual; yet it defines the good through a purely formal system of obligations, which is, in the end, no less abstract than abstract right. Ethical life is not presented as the original unity of the habits and customs of the community, but, rather, as a dynamic system in which individuals, families, civil society, and the state come together to promote the realization of human freedom.

Traditional accounts of Hegel’s social and political philosophy have seen Hegel’s account of ethical life as an apology for the Prussian state. This is understandable, given the role the state plays in the final section of the Philosophy of Right on “World History.” Here Hegel says “self-consciousness finds in an organic development the actuality of its substantive knowing and willing” in the Germanic state (Wood 1991, 379-380). To see the state as the culmination of world history and the ultimate realization of human freedom is, however, to overlook several important factors, including Hegel’s personal commitments to political reform and personal freedom. These commitments are reflected in Hegel’s defense of freedom in the Philosophy of Right, as well as the role he thought the family and especially civil society played in ethical life.

5. Aesthetics

The German idealists’ interest in aesthetics distinguishes them from other modern systematic philosophers (Descartes, Leibniz, Wolff ) for whom aesthetics was a matter of secondary concern at best. And while there was, to be sure, considerable disagreement about the relationship between art, aesthetics, and philosophy among the German idealists, the terms of their disagreement continue to be debated in philosophy and the arts.

For most of his career, Kant regarded aesthetics as an empirical critique of taste. In lectures and notes from the 1770s, several of which were later incorporated into Kant’s Logic (1800), Kant denies that aesthetics can be a science. Kant changed his mind in 1787, when he told Reinhold he had discovered the a priori principles of the faculty of feeling pleasure and displeasure. Kant laid out these principles in the first part of the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), where he characterizes aesthetic judgment as a “reflective” judgment, based on “the consciousness of the merely formal purposiveness in the play of the cognitive powers of the subject with regard to the animation of its cognitive powers” (Guyer and Matthews 2000, 106-107). According to Kant, it is the free yet harmonious play of our cognitive faculties in aesthetic judgment that is the source of the feeling of pleasure that we associate with beauty.

Reinhold and Fichte had little to say about art and beauty, despite Fichte’s promise to deal with the subject in the second, practical part of his Wissenschaftslehre. Aesthetics was, however, of critical importance for Schelling, Hegel, and Hölderlin. In the Oldest Program for a System of German Idealism, they write that beauty is “the idea that unites everything” and “the highest act of reason” (Bernstein 2003, 186). Thus they insist that the “philosophy of spirit” must also be an “aesthetic” philosophy, uniting the sensible and the intellectual as well as the real and the ideal.

It was Schelling, rather than Hegel or Hölderlin, who did the most to formulate this “aesthetic” philosophy in the years following his move to Jena. In the System of Transcendental Idealism and Philosophy of Art, Schelling argues that the absolute is both revealed by and embodied in works of art. Art is, for Schelling, “the only true and eternal organ and document of philosophy” (Heath 1978, 231). Art is of  “paramount” importance to the philosopher, because it opens up “the holy of holies, where burns in eternal and original unity, as if in a single flame, that which is rent asunder in nature and history and that which, in life and action, no less than in thought, must forever fly apart” (Heath 1978, 231).

Hegel would later contest Schelling’s characterization of the artwork and its relation to philosophy in his Lectures on Fine Arts. According to Hegel, art is not the revelation and embodiment of philosophy, but an alienated form of self-consciousness. The greatest expression of spirit is not to be found in the work of art, as Schelling suggested, but in the “idea.” Beauty, which Hegel calls “the sensuous appearance of the idea,” is not an adequate expression of the absolute, precisely because it is a sensuous appearance. Nevertheless, Hegel acknowledges that the alienated and sensuous appearance of the idea can play an important role in the dialectical process through which we become conscious of the absolute in philosophy. He distinguishes three kinds of art, symbolic art, classical art, and romantic art, corresponding to three different stages in the development of our consciousness of the absolute, which express different aspects of the idea in different ways.

Hegel argues that the kind of art that corresponds to the first stage in the development of our understanding of spirit, symbolic art, fails to adequately represent the idea, but points to the idea as something beyond itself. This “beyond” cannot be captured by images, plastic forms, or words and therefore remains abstract for symbolic art. However, the art corresponding to the second stage in the development of our understanding of spirit, classical art, strives to reconcile the abstract and the concrete in an individual work. It aims to present a perfect, sensible expression of the idea and, for that reason, represents the “ideal” of beauty for Hegel. Yet the problem remains, inasmuch as the idea which is expressed by classical art is not, in itself, sensible. The sensible presentation of the idea remains external to the idea itself. Romantic art calls attention to this fact by emphasizing the sensuousness and individuality of the work. Unlike symbolic art, however, romantic art supposes that the idea can be discovered within and through the work of art. In effect, the work of art tries to reveal the truth of the idea in itself. Yet when the idea is grasped concretely, in itself, rather than through the work of art, we have achieved a philosophical understanding of the absolute, which does not require the supplement of sensible appearance. For this reason, Hegel speculated that the emergence of philosophical self-consciousness signaled the end of art. “The form of art,” he says, “has ceased to be the supreme need of spirit” (Knox 1964, 10).

Hegel’s thesis concerning the “end” of art has been widely debated and raises many important questions. What, for example, are we to make of developments in the arts that occurred “after” the end of art? What purpose might art continue to serve, if we have already achieved philosophical self-consciousness? And, perhaps most importantly, has philosophy really achieved absolute knowledge, which would render any “sensuous appearance” of the idea obsolete? These are important questions, but they are difficult to answer. Like Kant and Schelling, Hegel’s views on aesthetics were part of his philosophical system, and they served a specific purpose within that system. To question the end of art in Hegel is, for that reason, to question the entire system and the degree to which it presents a true account of the absolute. Yet that also is why aesthetics and the philosophy of art allow us important insight into Hegel’s thought and the thought of the German idealists more generally.

6. Reception and Influence

Fichte, Hegel, and Schelling ended their careers in the same chair in Berlin. Fichte spent his later years reformulating the Wissenschaftslehre in lectures and seminars, hoping to finally find an audience that understood him. Hegel, who was called to take Fichte’s chair upon his death, lectured on the history of philosophy, the philosophy of history, the philosophy of religion, and the philosophy of fine art (his lectures on these subjects have been no less influential than his published works). Hegel gained a considerable following among both conservatives and liberals in Berlin, who came to be known as “right” (or “old”) and “left” (or “young”) Hegelians. Schelling’s views seem to have changed the most between the turn of the century and his arrival in Berlin. The “positive” philosophy he articulated in his late works is no longer idealist, because Schelling no longer maintains that being and thinking are identical. Nor does the late Schelling think that thought can ground itself in its own activity. Instead, thought must find its ground in “the primordial kind of all being.”

Arthur Schopenhauer (1788-1860), Søren Kierkegaard (1813-1855), and Karl Marx (1818-1883) all witnessed the decline of German idealism in Berlin. Schopenhauer had studied with Schulze in Göttingen and attended Fichte’s lectures in Berlin, but he is not considered a German idealist by many historians of philosophy. Some, like Günter Zöller, have argued against this exclusion, suggesting that the first edition of The World as Will and Representation is, in fact, “the first completely execute post-Kantian philosophical system” (Ameriks 2000, 101). Whether or not this system is really idealist is, however, a matter of some dispute. Claims that Schopenhauer is not an idealist usually take as their starting point the second part of The World as Will and Representation, where Schopenhauer claims that the representations of the “pure subject of cognition” are grounded in the will and, ultimately, in the body.

It is easier to distinguish Kierkegaard and Marx from the German idealists than Schopenhauer, though Kierkegaard and Marx are perhaps as different from one another as they could possibly be. Kierkegaard studied with the late Schelling, but, like Jacobi, rejected reason and philosophy in the name of faith. Many of his works are elaborate parodies of the kind of reasoning to be found in the works of the German idealists, especially Hegel. Marx, along with another one of Schelling’s students, Friedrich Engels (1820-1895), came to deride idealism as the “German ideology.” Marx and Engels charged that idealism had never really broken with religion, that it comprehended the world through abstract, logical categories, and, finally, mistook mere ideas for real things. Marx and Engels promoted their own historical materialism as an alternative to the ideology of idealism.

There is a tendency to overemphasize figures like Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, and Marx in the history of philosophy in the nineteenth century, but this distorts our understanding of the developments taking place at the time. It was the rise of empirical methods in the natural sciences and historical-critical methods in the human sciences, as well as the growth of Neo-Kantianism and positivism that led to the eclipse of German idealism, not the blistering critiques of Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Marx, and Nietzsche. Neo-Kantianism, in particular, sought to leave behind the speculative excesses of German idealism and extract from Kant those ideas that were useful for the philosophy of the natural and human sciences. In the process, they established Neo-Kantianism as the dominant philosophical school in Germany at the end of the nineteenth century.

Despite its general decline, German idealism remained an important influence on the British idealism of F.H. Bradley (1846-1924) and Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923) at the beginning of the twentieth century. The rejection of British idealism was one of common features of early analytic philosophy, though it would be wrong to suppose that Bertrand Russell (1872-1970), G.E. Moore (1873-1958), and others rejected idealism for purely philosophical reasons. The belief that German idealism was at least partly responsible for German nationalism and aggression was common among philosophers of Russell’s generation and only became stronger after World War I and World War II. The famous depiction of Hegel as an “enemy of liberty” and a “totalitarian” in The Open Society and its Enemies (1946) by Karl Popper (1902-1994) builds upon this view. And while it would be difficult to prove that any particular philosophy was responsible for German nationalism or the rise of fascism, it is true that the works of Fichte and Hegel were, like those of Nietzsche, favorite references for German nationalists and, later, the Nazis.

The works of the German idealists, especially Hegel, became important in France during the 1930s. Lectures on Hegel by Alexander Kojeve’s (1902-1968) influenced a generation of French intellectuals, including Georges Bataille (1897-1962), Jacques Lacan (1901-1981) and Jean-Paul Satre (1905-1980). Kojeve’s understanding of Hegel is idiosyncratic, but, together with the works of Jean Wahl (1888-1974), Alexandre Koyré (1892-1964), and Jean Hyppolite (1907-1968), his approach remains influential in continental European philosophy.  Objections to the anthropocentrism of German idealism can usually be traced back to this tradition and especially to Kojeve, who saw Hegel’s dialectic as a historical process through which the problems that define humanity are resolved. The end of this process is, for Kojeve, the end of history, which was popularized by Frances Fukayama (1952-) in The End of History and the Last Man (1992). Charges that German idealism is dogmatic, rationalist, foundationalist, and totalizing in its attempt to systematize, and ultimately an egocentric “philosophy of the subject,” which are also common in continental philosophy, merit more serious concern, given the emphasis Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel place on the “I” and the extent of their philosophical ambitions. Yet even these charges have been undermined in recent years by new historical scholarship and a greater understanding of the problems that actually motivated the German idealists.

There has been considerable interest in German idealism in the last twenty years, as hostility waned in analytic philosophy, traditional assumptions faded in continental philosophy, and bridges were built between the two approaches. Philosophers like Richard Bernstein and Richard Rorty, inspired by Wilfrid Sellars, may be credited with re-introducing Hegel to analytic philosophy as an alternative to classical empiricism. Robert Pippin later defended a non-metaphysical Hegel, which has been a subject of intense debate, but which has also made Hegel relevant to contemporary debates about realism and anti-realism. More recently, Robert Brandom has championed the “normative” conception of rationality that he finds in Kant and Hegel, and which suggests that concepts function as rules regulating judgment rather than mere representations. Some, like Catherine Malabou, have even attempted to apply the insights of the German idealists to contemporary neuroscience. Finally, it would be remiss not to mention the extraordinary historical-philosophical scholarship, in both German and English, that has been produced on German idealism in recent years. The literature listed in the bibliography has not only enriched our understanding of German idealism with new editions, translations, and commentaries, it has also expanded the horizons of philosophical scholarship by identifying new problems and new solutions to problems arising in different traditions and contexts.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Kant

i. German Editions of Kant’s Works

  • Weischedel. Wilhelm. ed. Kants Werke in sechs Bänden. Wiesbaden: lnsel Verlag, 1956-1962.
  • Kants Gesammalte Schriften, herausgegeben von der Preussischen Akademie der
  • Wissenschaften. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1902.

ii. Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant in Translation

  • Bowman, Curtis, Guyer, Paul, and Rauscher, Frederick, trans. and Guyer, Paul, ed. Immanuel Kant: Notes and Fragments. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Allison, Henry and Heath, Peter, eds. Immanuel Kant: Theoretical Philosophy After 1781. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • Guyer, Paul and Matthews, Eric, trans. and eds. Immanuel Kant: Critique of the Power of Judgment. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Arnulf Zweig, trans. and ed. Immanuel Kant: Correspondence. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Guyer, Paul and Wood, Allen W. Immanuel Kant: Critique of Pure Reason. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Heath, Peter and Schneewind, Jerome B., trans. and eds. Lectures on Ethics. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Ameriks, Karl and Naragon, Steve, trans. and eds. Immanuel Kant: Lectures on Metaphysics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Gregor, Mary, trans. and ed. Immanuel Kant: Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Wood, Allen W. and di Giovanni, George, trans. and eds. Immanuel Kant: Religion and Rational Theology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Walford, David and Meerbote, Ralf, trans. and eds. Immanuel Kant: Theoretical Philosophy, 1755-1770. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992.
  • Young, J. Michel, trans. and ed. Immanuel Kant: Lectures on Logic. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992.

iii. Other English Translations of Kant’s Works

  • Kemp Smith, Norman, trans. The Critique of Pure Reason. London: Palgrave MacMillan, 2003.
  • Pluhar, Werner, trans. Critique of Judgment, Including the First Introduction. Indianapolis: Hackett, Publishing, 1987.
  • Allison, Henry E., trans. The Kant-Eberhard Controversy. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1973.

b. Fichte

i. German Editions of Fichte’s Works

  • Fichte, Immanuel Hermann, ed. Fichtes Werke. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1971.
  • Lauth, Reinhard, Gliwitzky, Hans, and Jacob, Hans. eds. J.G. Fichte: Gesamtausgabe der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften. Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog Verlag, 1962.

ii. English Translations of Fichte’s Works

  • Green, Garrett, trans. Allen Wood, ed. Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Breazeale, Daniel and Zöller, Günter. The System of Ethics According to the principles of the Wissenschaftslehre. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Neuhouser. Frederick and Baur, Michael. trans. and eds. Foundations of Natural Right. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Breazeale, Daniel. trans. and ed. Introductions to the Wissenschaftslehre and Other Writings. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1994.
  • Breazeale, Daniel. trans. and ed. Foundations of the Transcendental Philosophy (Wissenschaftslehre Nova Methodo, 1796-1799). Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1992.
  • Breazeale, Daniel. trans. and ed. Early Philosophical Writings. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1988.
  • Preuss, Peter, trans. The Vocation of Man. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1987.
  • Heath. Peter and Lachs, John, trans. Science of Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982.
  • Jones, R. F. and Turnbull, George Henry, trans. Addresses to the German Nation. New York: Harper & Row, 1968.

c. Hegel

i. German Editions of Hegel’s Works

  • Eva Moldenhauer and Karl Markus Michel, eds. Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel: Werke. Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 1971-1979.
  • Hoffmeister. Johannes, ed. Briefe von und an Hegel, Hamburg: Meiner, 1969.
  • Deutsche Forschungsgemeinschaft in Verbindung mit der Rheiniscb-westfalischen
  • Akademie der Wissenschaften, ed. Hegels Gesammelte Werke. Kritische Ausgabe. Hamburg: Meiner Verlag, 1968.

ii. English Translations of Hegel’s Works

1. Cambridge Hegel Translations
  • Di Giovanni, George, trans. and ed. The Science of Logic. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Brinkmann, Klaus and Dahlstrom, Daniel O., trans. and ed. Encyclopaedia of the Philosophical Sciences in Basic Outline,  Part 1, Logic. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Bowman, Brady and and Speight, Allen. Heidelberg Writings. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009.
2. Other English Translations of Hegel’s Works
  • Nisbet, H.B., trans. Wood, Allen, ed. Elements of the Philosophy of Right. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. 1991.
  • Geraets, Theodore F., Harris, H.S., and Suchting, Wallis Arthur, trans. The Encylopedia Logic. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1991.
  • Brown, Robert, ed. Lectures on the History of Philosophy. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1990.
  • Burbidge. John S., trans. The Jena System 1804/1805: Logic and Metaphysics. Montreal: McGill/Queen's University Press, 1986.
  • Miller, A.V., trans. George, Michael and Vincent, Andrew, eds. The Philosophical Propadeutic. Oxford: Blackwell, 1986.
  • Hodgson, Peter and Brown, R. F., trans. Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1984-1986.
  • Dobbins, John and Fuss, Peter, trans. Three Essays 1793-1795. South Bend: University of Notre Dame Press, 1984.
  • Cerf, Walter and Harris, H.S., trans. System of Ethical Life and First Philosophy of Spirit. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1979.
  • Petry, Michael John, trans. and ed. Hegels Philosophie des subjektiven Geistes/Hegel's Philosophy of Subjective Spirit. Dordrecht: Riedel, 1978.
  • Miller, A.V. Phenomenology of Spirit. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977.
  • Cerf, Walter and Harris, H.S., trans. The Difference Between Fichte’s and Schelling’s System of Philosophy. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1977.
  • Cerf, Walter and Harris, H.S., trans. Faith and Knowledge. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1977.
  • Nisbet, H.B., trans. Lectures on the Philosophy of World History: Introduction. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975.
  • Wallace. William, trans. Hegel's Philosophy of Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1971.
  • Miller, A.V., trans. Philosophy of Nature. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1970.
  • Miller, A.V., trans. Science of Logic. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1969.
  • Knox, T.M. trans. Hegel's Aesthetics. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1964.

d. Schelling

i. German Editions of Schelling’s Works

  • Frank, Manfred and Kurz, Gerhard. eds. Materialien zu Schellings philosophischen Anfängen. Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1995.
  • Jacobs, Wilhelm G., Krings. Hermann, and Zeltner, Hermann, eds. F.W.J. von Schelling: Historisch-kritische Ausgabe. Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1976-.
  • Fuhrmans, Horst, ed. Schelling: Briefe und Dokumente. Bonn: Bouvier, 1973·

ii. English Translations of Schelling’s Works

  • Love, Jeff and Schmitt, Johannes, trans. Philosophical Investigations into the Essence of Human Freedom. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2007.
  • Matthews, Bruce, trans. The Grounding of Positive Philosophy. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2007.
  • Richey, Mason and Zisselsberger, Markus, trans. Historical-Critical Introduction to the Philosophy of Mythology. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2007.
  • Peterson, Keith R., trans. and ed. First Outline of a System of the Philosophy of Nature. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2004.
  • Steinkamp, Fiona, trans. Clara, or On Nature's Connection to the Spirit World. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2002.
  • Wirth, Jason M., Trans. The Ages of the World. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2000.
  • Bowie, Andrew, trans. On the History of Modern Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994
  • Pfau, Thomas, trans. and ed. Idealism and the Endgame of Theory: Three Essays by F.W.J. Schelling. Albany: State University of New York Press, I994.
  • Stott, Douglas W., trans. The Philosophy of Art. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1989.
  • Gutmann, James, trans. Philosophical Inquiries into the Nature of Human Freedom. La Salle: Open Court, 1989.
  • Harris, Errol and Heath. Peter, trans. Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Vater, Michael G., trans. Bruno, or On the Natural and the Divine Principle of Things Albany: State University of New York Press, 1984.
  • Marti, Fritz, trans. and ed. The Unconditional in Human Knowledge: Four Early Essays. Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press, 1980.
  • Heath, Peter, trans. System of Transcendental Idealism. Charlottesville, VA: University Press of Virginia, 1978.
  • Motgan, E. S. and Guterman, Norbert, trans. On University Studies. Athens: Ohio University Press, 1966.

e. Editions and Translations of Other Primary Sources

i. Jacobi

  • Hammacher, Klaus and Jaeschke, eds. Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi: Werke. Hamburg: Meiner Verlag, 1998.
  • Di Giovanni, George, trans. and ed. Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi: The: Main Philosophical Writings and the Novel Allwill. Montreal: McGill/Queen's University Press, 1994.
  • Klippen, Friedrich and von Roth, Friedrich, eds. Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi: Werke. Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1968.

ii. Reinhold

  • Hebbeler, James, trans., and Ameriks, Karl, ed. Letters on the Kantian Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Fabbianelli, Faustino, ed. Beiträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnis der Philosophen. Hamburg: Meiner Verlag, 2003.
  • Di Giovanni, George and Harris, H.S. Between Kant and Hegel: Texts in the Development of Post-Kantian Idealism. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2000.

iii. Hölderlin

  • Beissner, Friedrich, ed. Holderlin: Samtliche Werke, Grosser Stuttgarter Ausgabe. Stuttgart: Cotta, 1943-85.
  • Pfau, Thomas, trans. and ed. Essays and Letters on Theory, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1988.

iv. Kierkegaard, Søren

  • Cappelørn, N.J. et. al. Søren Kierkegaards Skrifter. Copenhagen: Gad, 1997.
  • Hong, Howard V. and Hong, Enda H., ed. Kierkegaard’s Writings. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1983-2009.

v. Marx

  • Pascal, Roy, ed.The German Ideology, New York: International Publishers, 1947.
  • Ryawnov, D., and Adoratskii, Vladimir Viktorovich, eds. Karl Marx und Friedrich Engels: Historisch-Kritisch Gesamtausgabe. Redin: Dietz Verlag, 1956.

vi. Schopenhauer

  • Janaway, Christopher and Norman, Judith and Welchman Alistair, trans. and eds. The World as Will and Representation. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Aquila, Richard and Carus, David, trans. The World as Will and Presentation. New York: Pearson Longman, 2008.
  • Payne, Eric F. and Zöller, Günter, trans. Prize Essay on the Freedom of the Will. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Payne. Eric F., trans. On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason. La Salle: Open Court, 1989.
  • Payne, Eric F., trans. The World as Will and Representation. New York: Dover, 1974.
  • Hübscher, Arthur, ed. Sammtliche Werke. Mannheirn: Brockhaus, 1988.

f. Other Works on German Idealism

  • Allison, Henry. Kant's Transcendental Idealism (2nd Edition) New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004.
  • Allison, Henry. Idealism and Freedom. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Ameriks, Karl, ed. The Cambridge Companion to German Idealism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Ameriks, Karl. Kant and the Fate of Autonomy: Problems in the Appropriation of the Critical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2.000.
  • Avineri, Shlomo. Hegel's Theory of the Modern State. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1972.
  • Baur, Michael and Dahlstrom, Daniel. eds. The Emergence of German Idealism. Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 1999.
  • Beiser, Frederick. Hegel. London: Routledge, 2005.
  • Beiser, Frederick, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Hegel. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Beiser, Frederick. Enlightenment, Revolution, and Romanticism: The Genesis of Modern German Political Thought. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1992.
  • Beiser, Frederick The Fate of Reason: German Philosophy from Kant to Fichte. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1987.
  • Breazeale, Daniel and Rockmore, Thomas, eds. Fichte: Historical Contexts/Contemporary Controversies. Atlantic Highlands: Humanities Press, 1997.
  • Bowie, Andrew. Aesthetics and Subjectivity: From Kant to Nietzsche (2nd Edition). Manchester: Manchester University Press, 2000.
  • Bowie, Andrew. Schelling and Modern European Philosophy. London: Routledge, 1993.
  • Cassirer, Ernst. Kant's Life and Thought, trans. James Haden. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1981.
  • Croce, Benedetto. What is Living and What is Dead in the Philosophy of Hegel, trans. Douglas Ainslie. New York: Russell & Russell. 1969.
  • Di Giovanni, George, ed. Essays on Hegel's Logic. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.
  • Findlay, J.N. Hegel: A Re-examination. London: George Allen and Unwin, 1958.
  • Forster, Michael. Hegel's Idea of a Phenomenology of Spirit. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1998
  • Forster, Michael. Hegel and Skepticism. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1989.
  • Guyer, Paul, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Kant. Cambridge; Cambridge University Press, 1992.
  • Hammer, Espen, ed. German Idealism: Contemporary Perspectives. London: Routledge, 2007.
  • Harris, H.S. Hegel's Development: Night Thoughts. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1983.
  • Harris, H.S. Hegel's Development: Towards the Daylight. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1972.
  • Henrich, Dieter. Between Kant and Hegel: Lectures on German Idealism. ed. David Pacini. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2003.
  • Houlgate, Stephen, ed. Hegel and the Arts. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2007.
  • Houlgate, Stephen. The Opening of Hegel’s Logic. West Lafayette: Purdue University Press, 2006.
  • Houlgate, Stephen, ed. Hegel and the Philosophy of Nature. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998.
  • Hyppolite. Jean. Genesis and Structure of the Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. S. Cherniak and R. Heckmann. Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1974.
  • Inwood, Michael. Hegel. London: Routledge, 1983.
  • Kojeve, Alexandre. Introduction to the Reading of Hegel, trans. J. H. Nichols. New York: Basic Books, 1960.
  • Kuehn, Manfred. Kant: A Life. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000
  • Longuenesse, Béatrice. Hegel’s Critique of Metaphysics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
  • Martin, Wayne. Idealism and Objectivity: Understanding Fichte's Jena Project. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
  • Neuhauser, Frederick. Fichte's Theory of Subjectivity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
  • O'Hondt, Jacques. Hegel in his Time. trans. John Burbidge. Peterborough: Broadview Press, 1988.
  • Pinkard, Terry. German Philosophy 1760-1860: The Legacy of Idealism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • Pinkard, Terry. Hegel: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Pinkard, Terry. Hegel's Phenomenology: The Sociality of Reason. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Pippin, Robert. Hegel on Self-Consciousness: Desire and Death in the Phenomenology of Spirit. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2010.
  • Pippin, Robert. Hegel’s Practical Philosophy: Rational Agency as ethical Life. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008.
  • Pippin, Robert. Hegel's Idealism: The Satisfactions of Self-Consciousness. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Priest, Stephen, ed. Hegel's Critiqut of Kant. Oxford.: Oxford University Press, 1987.
  • Redding, Paul. Analytic Philosophy and the Return to Hegelian Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Ritter, Joachim. Hegel and the French Revolution. Cambridge: MIT Press, 1982.
  • Rockmore, Tom. Before and After Hegel: A Historical Introduction to Hegel's Thought. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1993.
  • Sedgwick, Sally, ed. The Reception of Kant's Critical Philosophy: Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Snow, Dale. Schelling and the End of Idealism. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1996.
  • Solomon, Robert M. and Higgins, Kathleen M., eds. The Age of German Idealism. London: Routledge, 1993.
  • Stern, Robert. Hegelian Metaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press. 2009.
  • Taylor, Charles. Hegel. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975
  • Westphal, Kenneth. Hegel's Epistemological Realism: A Study of the Aim and Method of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1989.
  • White, Allen. Schelling: Introduction to the System of Freedom. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1983.
  • Wirth, Jason M., Ed. Schelling Now: Contemporary Readings. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2004.
  • Wood, Allen Kant's Ethical Thou.ght. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Wood, Allen. Hegel's Ethical Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
  • Zöller, Günter. Fichte's Transcendental Philosophy. The Original Duplicity of Intelligence and Will. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.


Author Information

Colin McQuillan
University of Tennessee Knoxville
U. S. A.


Nyāya (literally “rule or method of reasoning”) is a leading school of philosophy within the “Hindu umbrella”—those communities which saw themselves as the inheritors of the ancient Vedic civilization and allied cultural traditions. Epistemologically, Nyāya develops of a sophisticated precursor to contemporary reliabilism (particularly process reliabilism), centered on the notion of “knowledge-sources” (pramāṇa), and a conception of epistemic responsibility which allows for default, unreflective justification accorded to putatively veridical cognition. It also extensively studies the nature of reasoning in the attempt to map pathways which lead to veridical inferential cognition. Nyāya's methods of analysis and argument resolution influenced much of classical Indian literary criticism, philosophical debate, and jurisprudence. Metaphysically, Nyāya defends a robust realism, including universals, selves, and substances, largely in debate with Buddhist anti-realists and flux-theorists. Nyāya thinkers were also India’s most sophisticated natural theologians. For at least a millennium, Nyāya honed a variety of arguments in support of a baseline theism in constant engagement with sophisticated philosophical atheists, most notably Buddhists and Mīmāṁsakas (Hindu Ritualists).

Nyāya’s prehistory is tied to ancient traditions of debate and rules of reasoning (vāda-śāstra). The oldest extant Nyāya text is the Nyāya-sūtra attributed to Gautama (c. 200 C.E.). Throughout much of Nyāya’s formative period the philosophical development of the school took place through commentaries on the sūtras (with important exceptions including works of Jayanta, c. 875, Udayana, c. 975, and the somewhat heterodox Bhāsarvajña, c. 875). Leading commentators include Vātsyāyana (c. 450), Uddyotakara (c. 600) Vācaspati Miśra (c. 900) and Udayana. The school would enter its “new” phase (navya-nyāya) in the work of the eminent epistemologist Gaṅgeśa Upādhyāya (c. 1325). This article focuses on the older tradition of Nyāya, beginning with the sūtras, with occasional gestures toward developments within the new school.  Given the breadth of Nyāya thought, this discussion has to exclude some important topics for the sake of economy, such as aesthetics, philosophy of language, and theory of value. The article's primary focus is on epistemology and metaphysics. There is a brief consideration of Nyāya’s philosophy of religion.

Table of Contents

  1. Epistemology
    1. Perception
      1. The Characteristics of Perception
      2. Extraordinary Perceptual States
      3. Introspection
    2. Inference
      1. The Characteristics of Inference
      2. The Structure of Inference
      3. Inferential Defeaters or Fallacies
      4. Suppositional Reasoning
    3. Analogical Reasoning
    4. Testimony
    5. Non-pramāṇa Epistemic Capacities
    6. General Theory of Knowledge
      1. A Causal Theory of Knowledge
      2. Internalist Constraints
      3. A Relational Theory of Cognition
      4. Response to Skepticism
  2. Metaphysics
    1. Substance
    2. Quality
    3. Action
    4. Universal
    5. Inherence
    6. Individuator
    7. Absence
    8. Causation
  3. Philosophy of Religion
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Sanskrit Source Materials
    2. Primary Texts in English Translation
    3. Studies of Nyāya Epistemology, Metaphysics, and Philosophy of Religion in English
    4. General Studies

1. Epistemology

The Nyāya-sūtra opens with a list of its primary topics, sixteen items which may be grouped into the following four categories: epistemology, metaphysics, procedures and elements of inquiry, and debate theory. That Nyāya’s initial topic is epistemology (pramāṇas, “knowledge-sources”) is noteworthy. Both the sūtras and the commentarial tradition argue that epistemic success is central in the search for happiness, since we must understand the world properly should we desire to achieve the goods it offers.Vātsyāyana claims that while Nyāya’s metaphysical concerns overlap with other, more scripturally-based Hindu schools, what distinguishes Nyāya is a reflective concern with evidence, doubt and the objects of knowledge. He further defines Nyāya’s philosophical method as the “investigation of a subject by means of knowledge-sources” (NB 1.1.1). Importantly, the pramāṇas are not simply the means by which individuals attain veridical cognition. They are also the final court of appeals in philosophical dispute. Uddyotakara thus claims the best kind of demonstrative reasoning occurs when the pramāṇas are deployed in concert in order to establish a fact.

The four pramāṇas are perception, inference, analogical reasoning, and testimony. We will discuss them in order. Then, we will consider Nyāya’s theory of knowledge in general.

a. Perception (pratyakṣa)

i. The Characteristics of Perception

Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.4 defines perceptual cognition as follows.

A perceptual cognition arises by means of the connection between sense faculty and object, is not dependent on words, is non-deviating, and is determinate.

This sūtra provides four conditions which must be met for cognition to be perceptual. The first, that cognition arises from the connection between sense faculty and object, evinces Nyāya’s direct realism. It is such connection, the central feature of the causal chain which terminates in perceptual cognition, which fixes the intentionality of a token percept. Uddyotakara enumerates six kinds of connection (sannikarṣa) to account for the fact that that we perceive not only substances, but properties, absences, and so on: (i) conjunction (samyoga), the connection between a sense faculty and an object; (ii) inherence in what is conjoined (saṁyukta-samavāya), the connection between a sense faculty and a property-trope which inheres in an object; (iii) inherence in what inheres in what is conjoined (saṁyukta-samaveta-samavāya), the connection between a sense faculty and the universal which is instantiated in a property-trope; (iv) inherence (samavāya), the kind of connection which makes auditory perception possible; (v) inherence in what inheres (samaveta-samavāya), the connection between the auditory faculty and universals which inhere within sounds; (vi) qualifier-qualified relation (viśeṣya-viśeṣaṇa-bhāva), the connection which allows for the perception of inherence and absence in objects. In all cases, the perceptual cognition is born of connection between a sense faculty and an occurrent fact or object.

The second condition, that the cognition produced is not dependent on words, has a somewhat complicated interpretive history. Generally, Nyāya holds that ordinary perception involves concept deployment. Therefore, this restriction does not endorse a view held by the Buddhist Dignāga and his followers, that genuine perception is non-conceptual (kalpanā-apodha). Still, the meaning of avyapadeśya is disputed amongst Naiyāyikas. On one reading, this qualification serves the purpose of distinguishing between perceptually and testimonially generated cognitions. The latter also require information provided by the senses but further require the deployment of semantic and syntactic knowledge. An allied reading suggests that while involving the application of concepts, perception of an object is often causally prior to speech acts involving it.

The third, “non-deviating” condition blocks false cognitions, like the misperception that an oyster shell is a piece of silver, from the ranks of pramāṇa-born. This is tied to the Nyāya notion that pramāṇas are by definition inerrant, and that false cognitive presentations are not truly pramāṇas but pseudo-pramāṇas (pramāṇa-ābhāsa). Though we may mistakenly take a pseudo-pramāṇa, like the illusion of a person in the distance, to be the real thing, it is not. “Perception” and similar pramāṇa-terms have success grammar for Nyāya.

The fourth, “determinate” condition blocks cognitions which are merely doubtful from the ranks of the pramāṇa-born. Dubious cognitions, like that of a distant person at dusk, do not convey misleadingly false information, but being unclear, they do not properly apprehend the object in question. It could be a person or a post. As such, one neither correctly grasps its character nor falsely takes it to represent accurately a certain object. Later Naiyāyikas, most notably Vācaspati Miśra, read the qualifiers “notdependent on words” and “determinate” disjunctively, in order to say that perception may be non-propositional or propositional. However anachronistic this may be as an interpretation of the Nyāya-sūtra, this division is accepted by later Nyāya.

ii. Extraordinary Perceptual States

Nyāya admits of certain kinds of extraordinary perception in order to account for cognitive states that are perceptual in character, but distinct from those commonly experienced. They involve modes of sense-object connection other than the six kinds noted above. Later Nyāya (beginning at least with Jayanta) recognizes three kinds of extraordinary perception: (i) yogic perception, (ii) perception of a universal through an individual which instantiates it, and (iii) perception of an object’s properties as mediated by memory.

Yogic perception includes experiential states reported by contemplatives in deep mediation. Their cognitive objects (usually the deep self or God) are taken to be experienced in a direct and unmediated way, but generally without the operation of the external senses. Given their experiential character and their putative agreement with other sources of knowledge like scripture and inference, yogic experiences are prima facie taken to be veridical, produced by non-normal perception.

Perception of a universal through an individual which instantiates it is Nyāya’s response to the problem of induction. Nyāya holds that universals are perceptually experienced as instantiated in individuals (see the third of Uddyotakara’s six kinds of connection above). But the notion that we may have apprehension of all of the individuals which instantiate a universal, qua their being instantiations of the universal, is further accepted by Nyāya in order to explain how we attain to knowledge of vyāpti, or invariable relation between universals, which undergirds causal regularities of various sorts. Unless one’s experience of some particular smoke instance as conjoined with a fire instance allows him to experience all instances of smoke qua smoke as being conjoined with all instances of fire qua fire, through the natural tie between the universals smokiness and fieriness, inductive extrapolation would be impossible. Nyāya thus solves the problem of induction by appeal to extraordinary perception. This does not imply that we are always able to recognize such relations. It may take repeated experience for us to notice the ever-present connection. But when such recognition arises, it is due to perceptual experience, not an extrapolative projection of past experience.

Perception of the properties of an object mediated by memory involves the visual experience of unpresented properties of an object which is currently seen. Standard examples include seeing a piece of sandalwood as fragrant or seeing a piece of ice as cold. Here, there is a standard kind of sense object connection, but some of the phenomenal features of the experience, while veridical, are not generated by the ordinary connection. They are rather mediated by a special connection grounded in memory. What distinguishes this kind of perception from straightforward inference is that the property in question is experienced with a phenomenal character lacking in inference. This suggests that what may be considered inference for some may take the form of perception for others, depending on their familiarity with the conceptual connection between the properties in question.

iii. Introspection

Nyāya holds that while cognitions reveal or present their intentional objects, they rarely present themselves directly. When they are directly cognized, cognitions are grasped by other, apperceptive cognitions. As apperceptive awareness reveals a cognition along with its predication content or “objecthood” (that is, my cognition of a red truck is apperceptively cognized as having the predication content “red” and “truck-hood”), it is practically indefeasible. But, as Gaṅgeśa notes, this indefeasibility does transfer to the content of the original cognition (which is itself object of the apperceptive awareness). I may have mistaken a purple truck for a red truck, forgetting that my eyewear distorts certain colors. Apperception is subsumed by Nyāya into the category of perception. In this case, the operative sense faculty is the “inner organ” (manas) and the object is a cognition conceived of as a property of a self. Gaṅgeśa argues at length with a Prābhākara Mīmāṁsaka (a representative of another leading Hindu school), defending Nyāya’s version of apperception against the Mīmāṁsā view that each cognition itself has a component of reflectively self-awareness.

A few words on manas (the inner organ): NS 1.1.16 argues that the absence of simultaneous cognition from all of the senses indicates the presence of a faculty which governs selective attention. The manas is identified as this faculty, an insentient psychological apparatus which processes the information of the senses. A formulation of perception by the Vaiśeṣika school (Vaiśeṣika-sūtra 3.1.18), accepted by Nyāya, is that it normally consists in a chain of connection between four things: a self and its manas, the manas and a sense organ, and the sense organ and an object. Manas also is the faculty which governs mnemonic retrieval and, as noted above, apperceptive awareness of mental states. Selves, in the Nyāya view, are fundamentally loci of awareness, cognition, and mnemonic dispositions (saṁskāra). But just as they rely on the five senses to experience the world, they rely on manas for the functioning of memory and apperception.

To conclude, we may note that perception is commonly called the jyeṣṭapramāṇa (the “eldest” knowledge source) by Nyāya, since other pramāṇas depend on perceptual input, while perception operates directly on the objects of knowledge. Indeed, Gaṅgeśa suggests the following definition of a perceptual cognition: “a cognition that does not have another cognition as its proximate instrumental cause.” Inference, analogy, and testimony, on the other hand, depend on immediately prior cognitions to trigger their functioning. The normative status accorded to veridical perceptual cognition is primarily a matter of causation and intentionality (viṣayatā). If a cognition is caused by the appropriate causal chain, starting with the contact of a sense faculty and an external object (or, in the case of apperception, the internal organ and an immediately prior cognition), and the cognition produced has an “objecthood” or intentionality which accurately targets the object in question, the cognition is veridical and has the status prāmāṇya (pramāṇā-derived).

b. Inference (anumāna)

i. The Characteristics of Inference

Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.5 defines inference as follows.

[An inferential cognition] is preceded by that [perception], and is threefold: from cause to effect, from effect to cause or from that which is commonly seen.

This definition is somewhat elliptical. But it focuses on the fundamental character of inference: it is a cognition which follows from another cognition owing to their being conceptually connected in some way. Etymologically, anumāna means “after-cognizing”. Inference follows from an earlier cognition, “that” in the sūtra above. Vātsyāyana interprets “that” (tat) to refer to a perceptual cognition, and suggests that perceptual cognition precedes inference in two ways: (i) to engage in inference requires having perceptually established a fixed relationship between an inferential sign and the property to be inferred, and (ii) perceptual input triggers inference in that one must cognize the inferential sign as qualifying the locus of an inference. He provides a more explicit definition of inference as “a ‘later cognition’ of an object by means of cognition of its inferential sign” (NB 1.1.3).

Uddyotakara reasonably broadens the scope of “that” in NS 1.1.5 to refer to pramāṇa-produced cognitions of any kind which may trigger inference (NV 1.1.5). The meaning of reasoning from cause to effect and from effect to cause should be clear. Uddyotakara interprets reasoning from what is “commonly seen” as that which is grounded in non-causal correlations that have proven invariable. Vātsyāyana offers another reading: when the relationship between an inferential sign and the inferential target is not perceptible, the target may be inferred owing to the similarity of the unseen prover with something known. The classic example of this kind of inference is as follows: Desire, aversion, and knowledge are properties. Properties require substances which instantiate them. Therefore there is anunseen substance which instantiates desire, aversion, and knowledge: the inner self (NB 1.1.5). Though the connection between mental states like desire and the self which supports them is unseen, the similarity between mental states and other, commonly seen properties (like the color green) is enough to allow for the inference to a property-bearer.

The history of Nyāya’s logical theory is extensive. Here, we will note a few salient points and focus on inference as understood in the period most important to this study (the final great creative period of what is normally known as “Old Nyāya”). First, in Nyāya, logic is subsumed within epistemology, and therefore tends to have a strong informal and cognitive flavor, mapping paths of reasoning that generate veridical cognitions and noting the common ways that reasoning goes wrong. Fundamentally, one makes inferences for oneself. Formal proofs are meant to mirror the kind of reasoning that takes place internally, for didactic or polemical purposes. The first explicit recognition of this dual nature of inference is commonly attributed to the Buddhist Dignāga, who coined the terms svārthānumāna (inference for oneself) and parārthānumāna (inference for another). Such a division is implicit, however, in the Nyāya-sūtra’s distinction between inference as an individual’s source of knowledge (NS 1.1.5) and as a systematic method of proof meant to convince another (NS 1.1.32-39).

Second, inference is triggered by the recognition of a sign or mark, whose relationship with some other object (property or fact) has been firmly established. The primary cause of an inferential cognition is an immediately prior “subsumptive judgment” (parāmarśa) which grasps an inferential sign as qualifying an inferential subject (the locus of the inference), while recollecting the sign’s invariable concomitance with some other fact or object. The two fundamental requirements for inference are, therefore, awareness of pakṣadharmatā, the inferential mark’s qualifying the locus of the inference, and vyāpti, the sign’s invariable concomitance with the target property or probandum. A paradigmatic act of inference to oneself is: “There is fire on that mountain, since there is smoke on it,” which is supported by the awareness that fire is invariably concomitant with smoke. Naiyāyikas examine and standardize the conditions under which invariable concomitance (vyāpti) between a probans and a target fact is established.

Third, as logic’s function is to generate veridical cognition, Nyāya does not stress the distinction between soundness and validity in respect to the quality of an argument. Both formal fallacies and the inclusion of false premises lead to hetv-ābhāsa (“pseudo provers” or logical defeaters), since they engender false cognition.

ii. The Structure of Inference

Concerning inference for polemical or didactic purposes, Nyāya employs a formal five-step argument illustrated by the following stock example.

  1. There is fire on the hill (the pratijñā, thesis).
  2. Because there is smoke on the hill (the hetu, reason or probans).
  3. Wherever there is smoke, there is fire; like a kitchen hearth and unlike a lake (the udāharaṇa, illustration of concomitance).
  4. This hill is likewise smoky (the upanaya, application of the rule).
  5. Thus, there is fire on the hill (the nigamana, conclusion).

In practice, the five-membered “syllogism” is often truncated into three steps as follows.

A is qualified by S,
because it is qualified by T
(whatever is qualified by T is qualified by S) like (Tb&Sb).

Again, the stock example:

The hill is qualified by fieriness
because it is qualified by smokiness
(whatever is qualified by smokiness is qualified by fieriness) like a kitchen hearth and unlike a lake.

The basic components of the argument are:

  • the inferential subject (pakṣa), the locus of the inferential sign; the hill in our example. The general conditions for something to be taken up as a subject for inference, are that it be under dispute or currently unknown, with no reports from other knowledge sources available to definitively settle the issue.
  • the “prover” or inferential sign (hetu); smoke (more precisely, smokiness)
  • the probandum (sādhya), the property to be proved by the inference; fire (more precisely, fieriness)
  • the “pervasion” or concomitance (vyāpti) that grounds the inference, which is implicit in the step: “wherever there is smoke, there is fire
  • a corroborative instance (sapakṣa); a locus known to be qualified by both the prover (hetu) and the probandum (sādhya); this is a token of inductive support for the vyāpti; a kitchen hearth. There are also known negative examples, (vipakṣa) of something that lacks both the prover property and the probandum; where there is no fire, there is no smoke, like a lake. Obviously, an instantiation of the prover property in the vipakṣa class vitiates the argument.

This stock inference asserts that there is fire on the mountain (the mountain is qualified by the property of fieriness, Fm). Why?  Because the mountain is qualified by the property of smokiness, Sm. There is an implied concomitance which grounds the inference: “Whatever is qualified by smokiness is qualified by fieriness,” ∀x(Sx-->Fx). In the language of Nyāya, fire “pervades” smoke. This is an epistemic pervasion: we never find smoke instances without fire instances. As such, smoke is a prover property that allows us to infer the presence of fire. Finally, an example must be included in the syllogism to illustrate the inductive grounding which undergirds the invariable concomitance. In kitchen hearth k, fire is known to be concomitant with smoke, (Sk&Fk). In some instances, negative examples are used to indicate the vyāpti through contraposition. Wherever there is no fire there is no smoke, as illustrated in a lake, (~Fl& ~Sl).

Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.25 defines an example (dṛṣṭānta) as “something about which experts and laypersons have the same opinion (buddhi-sāmyam).” Vātsyāyana (NB Intro.; translation in Gangopadhyaya 1982: 5) elaborates:

Corroborative instance is an object of perception—an object about which the notions (buddhi) of the layman as well as the expert are not in conflict. . . It is also the basis of the application of nyāya (reasoning). By (showing) the contradiction of the dṛṣṭānta the position of the opponent can be declared as refuted. By the substantiation of the dṛṣṭānta, one’s own position is well-established. If the skeptic (nāstika) admits a corroborative instance, he has to surrender his skepticism. If he does not admit any, how can he silence his opponent?

Regarding agreement between laypersons and experts, the basic idea, of course, is that supporting examples should be non-controversial. A good illustration of this is found in Uddyotakara’s Nyāya-vārttika (2.1.16). Debating with a Buddhist interlocutor over the existence of property-bearing substances, he claims “there is no example whatever (na hi kaściddṛṣṭāntaḥ) . . . about which both parties agree (ubhaya-pakṣa-sampratipannaḥ).”

In another interpretation of the three kinds of inference in the sūtra, Uddyotakara introduces three kinds of argument: wholly-positive, wholly-negative, and positive-negative. Wholly-positive inference occurs when there are attested cases of sapakṣa but no vipakṣaknown. From a Buddhist perspective, the inference “whatever exists is momentary, like a cloud” would require this kind of inference, since there would be no available vipakṣato illustrate the non-presence of the prover. In cases where the property to be proven is entirely subsumed within the pakṣa, a wholly-negative form is employed. The vyāpti is contraposed, as in the following inference: “A living body has a self because it breathes. Whatever does not have a self does not breathe, like a pot.” Most inferences are in principle amenable to the positive-negative form, like “There is fire on that hill, since there is billowing smoke over it. Wherever there is smoke, there is fire, like a kitchen hearth, and unlike a lake.”

iii. Inferential Defeaters or Fallacies

Naiyāyikas provide various typologies of inferential fallacies and defeaters (hetv-ābāsa, “pseudo provers”). We may note five common kinds: (i) fallacies of deviation occur when the prover or inferential sign is not reliably correlated with the inferential target. To argue that “my mother must be visiting, since there is a Mazda parked outside” would involve the fallacy of deviation, since “Owning a Mazda” is a property that tracks not only my mother but many other drivers. It cannot, therefore, reliably indicate her presence. (ii) fallacies of contradiction occur when the prover in fact establishes a conclusion opposed to the thesis that someone defends. This would occur should someone argue that “Jones was not a kind man, since he gave his life for others,” as giving one’s life for others is an indicator of kindness or compassion. (iii) fallacies of unestablishment occur when a supposed prover is not actually the property of the inferential subject. Should someone argue “I know that your mother is in town, since I saw a Prius parked outside your home,” the prover is unestablished, since my mother does not in fact own a Prius. (iv) argumentsare rebutted, when their conclusions are undermined by information gleaned by more secure knowledge sources. Someone may argue that my friend must be out of town, since he hasn’t answered his phone all week. But if I just saw the friend in question at the local coffee shop, my perceptual knowledge rebuts his prover, invalidating it. Similarly, (v) arguments are counterbalanced when counterarguments of equal or greater force are put forth in support of an opposing conclusion. Disputant a argues that the inherent teleology of biological processes proves the existence of God. Disputant b argues that the existence of gratuitous evil proves that there is no God. Pending further philosophical work, argument b neutralizes the conclusion of argument a.

iv. Suppositional Reasoning

Tarka, suppositional or dialectical reasoning, is crucial to Nyāya’s philosophical program. Still, according to Vātsyāyana, it is not a full-fledged independent pramāṇa. Rather it is an “assistant to the pramāṇas” (pramāṇa-anugrahaka) (NB Introduction). Tarka is commonly employed as a form of reductio argument for the sake of judging competing claims or arguments, a reductio which depends not only on logical inconsistency, but on incoherence with deeply-held beliefs or norms. In the face of competing claims x and y about subject s, tarkais employed to show that x violates such norms, thereby shifting the presumptive weight to alternative y. Vātsyāyana (NB1.1.40) offers the example of competing claims about the nature of the self. Some say that the self is a product which comes to exist within time while others claim that it is unproduced and eternal. The Naiyāyika deploys tarkaby arguing that a consequence of the former view is that one’s initial life circumstances would not be determined by his karmic inheritance from previous lives, a severe violation of fundamental metaphysical positions held by almost every Indian school. As such, strong presumptive weight should be given to the latter view. This example illustrates the way in which considerations of negative coherence govern tarka’s deployment.

Vātsyāyana notes that the reason tarkais not an independent pramāṇa is that it does not independently establish the nature of the thing in question (anavadhāranāt). It provides consent (anujānāti) for one of two alternatives independently supported by apparent pramāṇas, by illustrating problems with the competing view. Uddyotakara (NV 1.1.1) adds that it is excluded from the ranks of pramāṇa because it does not provide definitive cognition (pramāṇamparicchedakaṁnatarkaḥ).

Later Naiyāyikas extol tarka as a means to test dubious inferential concomitances (vyāpti) by testing them against more fundamental holdings of various sorts. Tarka also has a crucial role in the management of philosophical doubt. Against the skeptic, Nyāya argues that doubt is not always reasonable. Tarka helps to distinguish legitimate doubt from mere contentiousness by illustrating which claims are better motivated and hence deserving of presumptive weight.

c. Analogical Reasoning (upamāna)

Nyāya-sūtra1.1.6 defines analogyas follows.

Analogy makes an object known by similarity with something already known.

Naiyāyikas commonly frame analogy as a means of vocabulary acquisition, and it has a severely restricted scope compared with the other pramāṇas. The standard example involves a person who is told that a water buffalo looks something like a cow and that such buffalo are present in a certain place in the countryside. Later, when out in the countryside, he recognizes that the thing he is seeing is similar to a cow, and therefore is a water buffalo. The cognition “That thing is a water buffalo,” born of the recollection of testimony regarding its similarity with a cow and the perception of such common features, is paradigmatically analogical. Though most of the other schools either reduce analogy to a more fundamental pramāṇaor conceive of it in very different terms (Mīmāṁsā conceives of it as the capacity by which we apprehend similarity itself), Nyāya contends that the cognition in question is sui generis analogical, though it incorporates information from other pramāṇas.

d. Testimony (śabda)

NS1.1.5 defines testimony as follows.

Testimony is the assertion of a qualified speaker.

The semantic range of āpta (“authority,” “credible person”) includes expertise, trustworthiness, and reliability. Vātsyāyana claims that an āpta possesses direct knowledge of something, and a willingness to convey such knowledge without distortion (NB 1.1.7). It is clear, though, that Nyāya does not require any kind of special expertise from such a speaker in normal situations. Nor does a hearer need positive evidence of trustworthiness. Mere absence of doubt in the asserter’s ability to speak authoritatively about the issue at hand is enough. Testimony is thus thought of as a transmission of information or content. A person attains an accurate cognition through some pramāṇatoken. In a properly functioning testimonial exchange, she bestows the information apprehended by the initial cognition to an epistemically responsible hearer. On such grounds, Uddyotakara notes that testimonial utterances may be divided into those whose contents are originally generated by perception or by inference. Jayanta likewise claims that the veridicality or non-veridicality of a testimonial cognition is dependent on the speaker’s knowledge of the content of her statement and her honesty in relating it.Vātsyāyana (NB 2.1.69) illustrates a levelheaded frankness about testimony’s importance, noting that “in accord with knowledge gained by testimony, people undertake their common affairs.” Uddyotakarasimilarlyrecognizes that testimony has the widest range of any source of knowledge, far outstripping what one may know from personal perception, inference or analogy.

e. Non-pramāṇa Epistemic Capacities

From the sūtra period, Nyāya recognizes a number of epistemic capacities which are nevertheless considered non-pramāṇa (NS 2.2.1-12). They are not considered independent pramāṇas for one of two reasons: (i) they are reducible to subspecies of other pramāṇas, or (ii) they do not produce the specific kind of cognitions which a pramāṇa must deliver. A core locus of debate amongst classical Indian thinkers is the nature and number of pramāṇas. Nyāya contends that the above four are the only irreducible sources of knowledge, which subsume all other kinds.

f. General Theory of Knowledge

i. A Causal Theory of Knowledge

Naiyāyikas speak of cognitive success in causal terms. “Pramāṇa” normally refers to a means or process by which veridical awareness-episodes (pramā) are generated, as seen above. Vātsyāyana glosses the meaning of pramāṇaas “that by which something is properly cognized (pramītyateanena)” (NB1.1.3).  Uddyotakara concurs: “what is spoken of as a pramāṇa? A pramāṇais the cause of a [veridical] cognition” (upalabdhi-hetupramāṇam) (NV1.1.1). Moreover, despite its focus on reflective consideration of belief and valid cognition, Nyāya argues that the simple,unreflective functioning of a pramāṇa like perception or testimony is enough to generate knowledge in the absence of countervailing evidence.

ii. Internalist Constraints

Nyāya does maintain an internalist constraint: Once doubt arises—by adversarial challenge, peer disagreement, inconsistency between differentcognitions, and so forth —a cognition must be validated in order to maintain the status of being “pramāṇa-produced.” Doubt triggers a second-order concern with reflective inquiry and certification. The sūtras state that “Where there is doubt, there must be ongoing examination” (NS 2.1.7). Uddyotakara therefore claims that doubt is an essential component of investigation (vicāra-aṅga) (NV 1.1.23). Validation involves consciously reflecting on the etiology of a cognition to ensure that it is the product of a properly-functioning pramāṇa. It may also involve the deployment of other pramāṇasin the hopes for a convergence of knowledge-sources (pramāṇa-saṁplava) in support of the doubted cognition. In his opening comments on the Nyāya-sūtra, Vātsyāyana famously provides a pragmatic test (but not definition) of truth: cognitions which guide us to successful action are likely veridical.

iii. A Relational Theory of Cognition

Nyāya epistemologists speak of cognition (jñāna, buddhi, upalabdhi, pratyaya): generally immediate awareness states of what Nyāya understands to be a mind-independent external reality. In the case of apperception, one cognizesher own mental states. Ontologically, cognitions are considered properties (guṇas) of individual selves (ātmans). Memory dispositions, when triggered, generate cognition about the past. With a few exceptions, cognitions target things other than themselves.

For Nyāya, cognitions target their objects by means of a relation called “objecthood” (viṣayatā). Nyāya’s theory is thus not exactly representational, but relational. “Objecthood” minimally has a threefold structure (with the possibility of iteration) corresponding to three features of the external object in question: a portion of the cognition targets an object itself, a portion of the cognition targets a property of the object, and finally, a portion of the cognition targets the relationship between the object and its property. In cases of veridical cognition (pramā), the portion of cognition which targets a substantive and the portion which targets its property match up. Gaṅgeśa famously defines veridical cognition as “a cognitive state with predication content x about something in fact qualified by x” (Tattvacintāmaṇi, pramā-lakṣaṇa-vāda). Seeing a male human being as qualified by “man” would be a paradigm case of veridical cognition. Error is generally classified as a misfire of the property-scoping portion of cognition. In error, a substantive is indeed cognized, but the property which is targeted does not actually qualify the substantive in question. The cognition’s intentionality is bifurcated, so to speak, simultaneously scoping a substantive and a property which is in fact alien to it.

iv. Response to Skepticism

Nyāya is a staunchly anti-skeptical tradition of epistemology. While it does give an important role to doubt, which, as seen above, triggers reflection and philosophical review, it rejects the notion that doubt should be the starting place in philosophical reflection. Doubt itself should be motivated, as trust is a better default starting place in both ordinary life and philosophy. Pragmatically, Nyāya argues that the role of epistemology is to better hone our cognitive abilities in order to succeed in our life aims. But unrestricted doubt would undermine our ability to function on a basic level, and it therefore militates against the very point of epistemological inquiry. Theoretically, Nyāya argues that error and indeed doubt itself are conceptually parasitical on true cognition. Error and doubt only make sense against a background of true belief, and therefore reflection must start by taking putatively veridical cognition at face value. Allied to this is a strain of criticism that even the simple act of giving voice to skeptical arguments belays a philosopher’s dependence on knowledge sources, including the inductively-supported tie between words and their meanings, which a skeptic relies on to speak his case. Given that everyone, the skeptic included, relies on pramāṇas, they are to be given the lion’s share of default entitlement.

2. Metaphysics

Nyāya defends a realist and pluralist metaphysics of categories (padārthas, lit. “things denoted by words”), largely adapted, with some modifications, from its sister school Vaiśeṣika. The categories are substance, quality, action, universal, individuator, inherence and absence. They will be discussed individually below.

a. Substance (dravya), Including Self (ātman)

Substances are the bedrock of Nyāya/Vaiśeṣika metaphysics (hereafter, simply “Nyāya Metaphysics”), as other categories generally inhere within substances or are nested within properties that inhere within substances. Paradigmatic substances include the indestructible atoms of earth, water, air and fire; composite substances like pots and trees; inner “selves” (ātman) which are the eternal, reincarnating souls; and God, a unique ātman.

Naiyāyikas provide a number of arguments in support of a non-material self. A standard argument runs as follows: Things like desire, cognition, experiences of pleasure and pain and volition are qualities. All qualities inhere in substances. Therefore, there is a substance to which desire and the rest belong. This conclusion is then followed by an argument from elimination. None of the material elements like earth or water are the bearers of desire and the rest. Therefore, there must be a special, non-material substance, namely a self (see various commentaries on NS 1.1.10). This argument is bolstered by others meant to illustrate that the physical body, as a product of material elements cannot be the fundamental locus of conscious states.

Some of the richest debates in classical India take place between Nyāya and Buddhists over the reality of substances. The central concern of such debates is often the statusof individual selves—an important substance, to say the least. Famously, the Buddha declared that reality is “lacking a self” (anātman), and his followers develop a number of arguments which purport to illustrate this in two ways. (i) Diachronically: moment by moment, things are destroyed and new things arise, such that no substance (including selves) endures for longer than a moment. (ii) Synchronically: in a single moment, what we take to be wholes (including selves) are nothing more than heaps of micro-properties (illustrated by the famous chariot metaphor in The Questions of King Milinda.) The Buddhist position is that although there is no such thing as an enduring self, the need for moral continuity and other desiderata may be satisfied merely by the causal connections between events in a single causal stream which we refer to as a “person.”

Nyāya’s response is to defend the existence of substances generally and selves in particular. In defense of substances, it argues that composite substances have capacities beyond the mere collection of their parts (NS 2.1.35). Moreover, Nyāya argues that the Buddhist reduction, if carried out consistently, would lead to an absurdity. We can see composite substances, but we cannot seeentities like atoms, which exist below our perceptual threshold. But if substances are nothing but heaps of micro objects/properties, which themselves can be reduced, and so on, then we should not be able to perceive substances at all. Thus, there must be a unified identity for individual substances which undergirds their availability for perceptual experience (NS 2.1.36).

In defense of the diachronic existence of individual selves, Nyāya argues that our experience of recollection (“that is the very man I saw a week ago”) requires a locus of memory which spans the time between the initial experience and the re-experience of an object (NS 1.1.10 and allied commentaries). In this spirit, Uddyotakara, following Vātsyāyana, argues that if I am now a different self than the “me” of yesterday, I should not be able to recollect things which that “me” experienced, since one self is unable to recollect the content of another’s experience. In defense of the synchronic identity of selves, Nyāya argues that cross-modal recognition (“that thing I see is the same thing I am touching”) requires a single experiencer with the ability to synthesize data from various senses (NS 3.1.1-3). Early Nyāya’s arguments for the self find their apex in Udayana’s monograph Determining the Truth of the Self.

b. Quality

Qualities (guṇa), are property tropes which qualify substances. Unlike universals they are not repeatable. The red color of some particular fire hydrant is a quality. Like other instances of the color red it is inhered by the universal redness, but it is as particular as the hydrant which it qualifies. Qualities include color, number (which is thought to inhere in objects), spatial location, contact, disjunction, and so forth, along with qualities which are unique to selves, like desire, cognition, and karmic merit.

c. Action

Like qualities, actions (karma) inhere in substances and are non-repeatable tropes. But they have causal capacities which qualities lack, particularly the ability to engender conjunction and disjunction between substances.

d. Universal

Universals (sāmānya or jāti) inhere in substances (for examplepot-hood), qualities (redness) or motions (contraction-hood). Naiyāyikas argue that universals are required to account for common experiences of a recurring character, for the functioning of language, andto undergird causal regularities in nature (which are held to be relations between universals). As its theory of universals is developed, Nyāya recognizes entities which are like universals, but which are, for theoretical reasons, excluded from their ranks (upādhi). Udayana would famously chart the reasons for such exclusion. These are: (i) A true universal must be capable of more than one instance. Spacehood would not be a true universal, as it can only have one instance. (ii) Two universals which have the same exact instances are in fact the same universal, simply under two designations. (iii) Should two apparent universals share an instance, while one is not entirely subsumed within the other, both are mere upādhis. This criterion, which is the most controversial of the “universal-blockers,” suggests that the operative notion of universal here is something akin to natural kinds. (iv) Any supposed universal that would, if accepted, lead to an infinite regress (for example universal-hood), is not accepted. (v) There is no universal for individuators (see below), as their ontic function is to introduce primitive differentiation. (vi) There is no universal for inherence (see below), as this would engender a vicious infinite regress: inherence would require further inherence between it and its universal “inherencehood”, and so on.

e. Inherence

Inherence is a relation which is central to Nyāya’s ontology, by which qualities, actions, universals, and individuators relate to substances, by which universals relate to qualities and actions, and by which wholes relate to their parts. In the first instance, the brown color of a cow inheres in the cow. In the second, the universal brownness inheres in the quality trope brown. In the third, my car, a substance, is a single entity, which inheres in its various parts. Thus, your touching just one part of my car is enough to justify the claim “you touched my car” simpliciter. Nyāya contends that inherence is a self-linking property. It does not rely on other instances of inherence in order to “glue” it to the two elements which it relates. Thus it seeks to rebut regress arguments of the type advanced by recently by F. H. Bradley and by the classical Vedāntin Śaṅkarācārya (c. 9th century C.E.) in classical India.

f. Individuator

Individuators are the finest-grained causes of ontological distinction. They are the means by which individual atoms within the basic kinds “earth”, “water”, and so forth, and by which individual selves are ultimately particularized. Individuators for Nyāya’s ontology may be conceived as roughly analogous to haecceities within Western philosophical discourse.

g. Absence

The ontological reality of absence, however attenuated, isaccepted by Nyāya in order to account for both linguistic practice involving negation and cognitive states which correctly ascertain non-existence of some kind.Vātsyāyana argues that the positive knowledge produced by a knowledge sourcegives immediate rise to knowledge of an absence insofar as one can reflect that if something was not made manifest at the time of the initial cognition (and provided that the thing in question is ordinarily cognizable), it was absent. Uddyotakara famously argues that negation is often perceptible: looking at my desk, I see the absence of a coffee mug, and such absence is “located” on the surface my desk. In this spirit, absence is generally thought of as a qualifier (viśeṣana) of some object or property, which is the qualificand (viśeṣya). The four basic kinds of absences accepted by Nyāya in its mature period are prior absence (of something before it is created), absence-by-destruction (of an object after it is destroyed), absolute absence (of something for some locus where it could never exist), and mutual absence (between two separately existing objects).

h. Causation

Naiyāyikas speak of a cause or causal condition as something which is necessarily antecedent to aspecific kind of effect without being “causally irrelevant”. Such causes are threefold. The (i) inherence cause, akin to a material cause, is the substratum out of which (or within which) an effect is made (the threads which together make up a cloth). The (ii) non-inherence cause includes properties of the inherence cause which influence the properties of the effect (the property of contact which inheres within the threads which make up a cloth). Finally, (iii), the instrumental/agential cause(s). This third category is a kind of catch-all which includes everything aside from the substratum and its properties. Central in this category are agents, their activities, and instruments used by then to produce effects. Out of the nexus of causal conditions which come together in the production of an effect, Naiyāyikas tend to speak of a most important factor as the trigger cause (for example the striking of a match against a rough surface which produces a lit match).

In order to weed out unnecessary or unimportant factors from the causal nexus which produces an effect, Nyāya includes the caveat that a proper cause must not be “causally irrelevant”. Causal irrelevance occurs in various ways. For example, something x which universally precedes a certain effect y, but whose relationship with the effect is mediated by some other factor z upon which it subsists is causally irrelevant. For example, a certain artist may create a unique kind of sculpture, and she is thus identified as a causal factor in its production. She may have certain properties (hair color, eye color, height) which also, by means of their subsisting in her, invariably precede the production of her sculptures. But since their participation in the causal event is derivative, they are deemed causally irrelevant and unworthy of being specified as causes.

3. Philosophy of Religion

Nyāya expressly conceives of itself as a rational defender of classical Hindu religious and theistic culture. Nyāya-sūtra begins by claiming that ascertainment of the ultimate good (niḥśreya) requires correct apprehension of reality, which gives rise to a sustained epistemological/metaphysical investigation of the kind the sūtras provide.Vātsyāyanaargues that as a discipline of inquiry, Nyāya is the support of all practices of legitimate dharma. Jayanta claims that amongst the various research programs in the umbrella of classical Vedic culture, Nyāya is of chief importance, since it aims to defend Vedic tradition and its manifold subdivisions of study from the attacks of rival, anti-Vedic philosophers. Though the Nyāya-sūtra overwhelmingly focuses on theoretical issues and not praxis, it nonetheless recommends that students of Nyāya engage in yogic practice (4.2.42) and defends the possibility of enlightenment (4.2.44-5).

From fairly early in its history, Nyāya specifically takes it upon itself to defend the existence of God (Īśvara). Nyāya primarily employs versions of the design inference. Paradigmatic arguments include:

Primordial matter, atoms and karma function when guided by a conscious agent because they are insentient (acetaṇatvāt) like an axe. As axes, due to insentience, operate only when directed by a sentient agent, so too do things like primordial nature, atoms and karma. Therefore, they too are directed by a cause possessed of intelligence. (Uddyotakara, NV 4.1.21)

Things like the earth have a maker as their cause, because they are products (kāryatvāt). (Udayana Nyāyakusumāñjali, Fifth Chapter)

With various formulations like the above, and extensive supporting arguments, Nyāya defends a version of the argument from design. Buddhist, Mīmāṁsā (and later, Jain) philosophers respond by charging Nyāya with violations of inferential boundaries: only by extrapolating far beyond the correlation between ordinary products and makers is Nyāya able to argue for a unique God-like maker of the world. A standard response, as seen in Vācaspati (NVT 4.1.21) is that even in straightforward general-to-particular inductive reasoning, we employ some degree of inference to the best explanation. This allows enough flexibility to infer new kinds of entities while appealing to correlations generated from ordinary experience.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Sanskrit Source Materials

  • JayantaBhaṭṭa. Nyāya-mañjarī. Critically Edited by Vidvan, K. S. Varadacarya.Vol 1. Mysore: Oriental Research Institute 1969.
  • JayantaBhaṭṭa. Nyāya-mañjarī. Critically Edited by Vidvan, K. S. Varadacarya.Vol 2. Mysore: Oriental Research Institute 1983.
  • Nyāya-Tarkatirtha, Taranatha and Amarendramohan Tarkatirtha, eds. Nyāyadarśanamwith Vātsyāyana’sBhāṣya [cited as NB above], Uddyotakara’s Vārttika[cited as NV], Vācaspati Miśra’s Tātparyaṭīkā [cited as NVT] & Viśvanātha’s Vṛtti. Calcutta: Munshiram Manoharlal 2003.
  • Udayana. Nyāyavārttikatātpāryaśuddhi of Udayanācārya. Edited by Anantalal Thakur. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research.

b. Primary Texts in English Translation

  • Gangopadhyaya, Mrinalkanti, trans. Nyāya: Gautama’s Nyāya-sūtra with Vātsyāyana’s Commentary. Calcutta: Indian Studies 1982.
  • Iyer, S. R., Editor and Translator, Tarkabhāṣā of Keśava Miśra. Varanasi: Chaukhambha Orientalia, 1979.
  • JayantaBhaṭṭa. Nyāya-mañjarī. Translated by JanakiVallabhaBhattacaryya.Vol. 1. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass 1978.
  • Jha, Sir Ganganatha, trans. The Nyāya-sūtras of Gautama.Vols 1-4. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass 1999.
  • Phillips, Stephen and N. S. Ramanuja Tatacharya. Epistemology of Perception: Gaṅgeśa’s Tattvacintāmaṇi Jewel of Reflection on the Truth (About Epistemology), The Perception Chapter (pratyakṣa-khaṇḍa). New York: American Institute of Buddhist Studies 2004. [This also contains the Sanskrit text.]
  • Potter, Karl H., ed. Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies.Vol. 2. Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass 1977. [This volume contains summary translations and helpful historical and conceptual introductions to early Nyāya and its individual philosophers.]
  • Udayana. Ātmatattvaviveka. Translation and commentary by N. S. Dravid.  Shimla: Indian Institute of Advanced Study 1995. [This also contains the Sanskrit text.]
  • Udayana. Nyāyakusumāñjali. Translation and commentary by N. S. Dravid. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research 1996. [This also contains the Sanskrit text.]

c. Studies of Nyāya Epistemology, Metaphysics, and Philosophy of Religion in English

  • Bhattacaryya, Gopikamohan. Studies in Nyāya-vaiśeṣika Theism. Calcutta: Sanskrit College 1961.
  • Chakrabarti, Kisor Kumar. Classical Indian Philosophy of Mind: The Nyāya Dualist Tradition. Albany: State University of New York Press 1999.
  • Chemparathy, George. An Indian Rational Theology: Introduction to Udayana’s Nyāyakusumāñjali. Publications of the De Nobili Research Library, Vol. 1. Vienna: Gerold& Co.; Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass 1972.
  • Ghokale, Pradeep P. Inference and Fallacies Discussed in Ancient Indian Logic (with special reference to Nyāya and Buddhism). Bibliotheca Indo-Buddhica Series, Sunil Gupta, ed.Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications 1992.
  • Halbfass, Wilhelm. On Being and What There Is: Classical Vaiśeṣika and the History of Indian Ontology. Albany: State University of New York Press 1992. [Though this text focuses on Vaiśeṣika, it is relevant given the great overlap between Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika in metaphysical theory.]
  • Matilal, B. K. Perception. Oxford: Clarendon Press: Oxford 1986.
  • Matilal, B. K. The Character of Logic in India. Albany: SUNY Press 1998.

d. General Studies

  • Ganeri, Jonardon. Philosophy in Classical India: The Proper Work of Reason. London and New York: Routledge 2001.
  • Matilal, B. K. Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika. A History of Indian Literature, Vol. 6, Fasc. 2. Edited by Jan Gonda. Weisbaden: Otto Harrassowitz 1977.
  • Mohanty, J.N. Classical Indian Philosophy. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 2000.
  • Phillips, Stephen. Classical Indian Metaphysics: Refutations of Realism and the Emergence of “New Logic.” Chicago: Open Court 1995.

Author Information

Matthew R. Dasti
Bridgewater State University
U. S. A.

Ordinary Language Philosophy

Ordinary Language philosophy, sometimes referred to as ‘Oxford’ philosophy, is a kind of ‘linguistic’ philosophy. Linguistic philosophy may be characterized as the view that a focus on language is key to both the content and method proper to the discipline of philosophy as a whole (and so is distinct from the Philosophy of Language). Linguistic philosophy includes both Ordinary Language philosophy and Logical Positivism, developed by the philosophers of the Vienna Circle (for more detail see Analytic Philosophy section 3). These two schools are inextricably linked historically and theoretically, and one of the keys to understanding Ordinary Language philosophy is, indeed, understanding the relationship it bears to Logical Positivism. Although Ordinary Language philosophy and Logical Positivism share the conviction that philosophical problems are ‘linguistic’ problems, and therefore that the method proper to philosophy is ‘linguistic analysis’, they differ vastly as to what such analysis amounts to, and what the aims of carrying it out are.

Ordinary Language philosophy is generally associated with the (later) views of Ludwig Wittgenstein, and with the work done by the philosophers of Oxford University between approximately 1945-1970. The origins of Ordinary Language philosophy reach back, however, much earlier than 1945 to work done at Cambridge University, usually marked as beginning in 1929 with the return of Wittgenstein, after some time away, to the Cambridge faculty. It is often noted that G. E. Moore was a great influence on the early development of Ordinary Language philosophy (though not an Ordinary Language philosopher himself), insofar as he initiated a focus on and interest in ‘commonsense’ views about reality. Major figures of Ordinary Language philosophy include (in the early phases) John Wisdom, Norman Malcolm, Alice Ambrose, Morris Lazerowitz, and (in the later phase) Gilbert Ryle, J. L. Austin and P. F. Strawson, amongst others. However, it is important to note that the Ordinary Language philosophical view was not developed as a unified theory, nor was it an organized program, as such. Indeed, the figures we now know as ‘Ordinary Language’ philosophers did not refer to themselves as such – it was originally a term of derision, used by its detractors. Ordinary Language philosophy is (besides an historical movement) foremost a methodology – one which is committed to the close and careful study of the uses of the expressions of language, especially the philosophically problematic ones. A commitment to this methodology as that which is proper to, and most fruitful for, the discipline of philosophy, is what unifies an assortment of otherwise diverse and independent views.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Cambridge
    1. Analysis and Formal Logic
    2. Logical Atomism
    3. Logical Positivism and Ideal Language
    4. Ordinary Language versus Ideal Language
  3. Ordinary Language Philosophy: Nothing is Hidden
    1. The Misuses of Language
    2. Philosophical Disputes and Linguistic Disputes
    3. Ordinary Language is Correct Language
    4. The Paradigm Case Argument
    5. A Use-Theory of Linguistic Meaning
  4. Oxford
    1. Ryle
    2. Austin
    3. Strawson
  5. The Demise of Ordinary Language Philosophy: Grice
  6. Contemporary Views
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Analysis and Formal Logic
    2. Logical Atomism
    3. Logical Positivism and Ideal Language
    4. Early Ordinary Language Philosophy
    5. The Paradigm Case Argument
    6. Oxford Ordinary Language Philosophy
    7. Criticism of Ordinary Language Philosophy
    8. Contemporary views
    9. Historical and Other Commentaries

1. Introduction

For Ordinary Language philosophy, at issue is the use of the expressions of language, not expressions in and of themselves. So, at issue is not, for example, ordinary versus (say) technical words; nor is it a distinction based on the language used in various areas of discourse, for example academic, technical, scientific, or lay, slang or street discourses – ordinary uses of language occur in all discourses. It is sometimes the case that an expression has distinct uses within distinct discourses, for example, the expression ‘empty space’. This may have both a lay and a scientific use, and both uses may count as ordinary; as long as it is quite clear which discourse is in play, and thus which of the distinct uses of the expression is in play. Though connected, the difference in use of the expression in different discourses signals a difference in the sense with which it is used, on the Ordinary Language view. One use, say the use in physics, in which it refers to a vacuum, is distinct from its lay use, in which it refers rather more flexibly to, say, a room with no objects in it, or an expanse of land with no buildings or trees. However, on this view, one sense of the expression, though more precise than the other, would not do as a replacement of the other term; for the lay use of the term is perfectly adequate for the uses it is put to, and the meaning of the term in physics would not allow speakers to express what they mean in these other contexts.

Thus, the way to understand what is meant by the ‘ordinary use of language’ is to hold it in contrast, not with ‘technical’ use, but with ‘non-standard’ or ‘non-ordinary’ use, or uses that are not in accord with an expression’s ‘ordinary meaning’. Non-ordinary uses of language are thought to be behind much philosophical theorizing, according to Ordinary Language philosophy: particularly where a theory results in a view that conflicts with what might be ordinarily said of some situation. Such ‘philosophical’ uses of language, on this view, create the very philosophical problems they are employed to solve. This is often because, on the Ordinary Language view, they are not acknowledged as non-ordinary uses, and attempt to be passed-off as simply more precise (or ‘truer’) versions of the ordinary use of some expression – thus suggesting that the ordinary use of some expression is deficient in some way. But according to the Ordinary Language position, non-ordinary uses of expressions simply introduce new uses of expressions. Should criteria for their use be provided, according to the Ordinary Language philosopher, there is no reason to rule them out.

Methodologically, ‘attending to the ordinary uses of language’ is held in general to be in opposition to the philosophical project, begun by the Logical Atomists (for more detail on this movement, see below, and the article on Analytic Philosophy, section 2d.) and taken up and developed most enthusiastically by the Logical Positivists, of constructing an ‘ideal’ language. An ideal language is supposed to represent reality more precisely and perspicuously than ordinary language. Ordinary Language philosophy emerged in reaction against certain views surrounding this notion of an ideal language. The ‘Ideal Language’ doctrine (which reached maturity in Logical Positivism) sees ‘ordinary’ language as obstructing a clear view on reality – it is thought to be opaque, vague and misleading, and thus stands in need of reform (at least insofar as it is to deliver philosophical truth).

Contrary to this view, according to Ordinary Language philosophy, it is the attempt to construct an ideal language that leads to philosophical problems, since it involves the non-ordinary uses of language. The key view to be found in the metaphilosophy of the Ordinary Language philosophers is that ordinary language is perfectly well suited to its purposes, and stands in no need of reform – though it can always be supplemented, and is also in a constant state of evolution. On this line of thought, the observation of and attention to the ordinary uses of language will ‘dissolve’ (rather than ‘solve’) philosophical problems – that is, will show them to have not been genuine problems in the first place, but ‘misuses’ of language.

On the positive side, the analysis of the ordinary uses of language may actually lead to philosophical knowledge, according to at least some versions of the view. But, the caveat is, the knowledge proper to philosophy is knowledge (or, rather, improved understanding) of the meanings of the expressions we use (and thus, what we are prepared to count as being described by them), or knowledge of the ‘conceptual’ structures our use of language reflects (our ‘ways of thinking about and experiencing things’). Wittgenstein himself would have argued that this ‘knowledge’ is nothing new, that it was available to all of us all along – all we had to do was notice it through paying proper attention to language use. Later Ordinary Language philosophers such as Strawson, however, argued that this did count as new knowledge – for it made possible new understanding of our experience of reality. Hence, on this take, philosophy does not merely have a negative outcome (the ‘dissolution’ of philosophical problems), and Ordinary Language philosophy need not be understood as quietist or even nihilist as has been sometimes charged. It does, however, turn out to be a somewhat different project to that which it is traditionally conceived to be.

2. Cambridge

The genesis of Ordinary Language philosophy occurred in the work of Wittgenstein after his 1929 return to Cambridge. This period, roughly up to around 1945, represents the early period of Ordinary Language philosophy that we may characterize as ‘Wittgensteinian’. We shall examine these roots first, before turning to its later development at Oxford (which we will continue to call ‘Oxford’ philosophy for convenience) – development that saw significant evolution and variation in the view.

The Cambridge period may be characterized as ‘Wittgensteinian’ because the Ordinary Language philosophers of the time were close followers of Wittgenstein. Many were his pupils at Cambridge, or associates of those pupils who later traveled to other parts of the world transmitting Wittgenstein’s thought, including Ambrose, Lazerowitz, Malcolm, Gasking, Paul, Von Wright, Black, Findlay, Bouwsma and Anscombe to name a few. (See P. M. S. Hacker (1996) for a more detailed historical account, and biographical details, of the Cambridge and Oxford associates of Wittgenstein.) They cleaved closely to the views they believed they found in Wittgenstein’s work, much of which was distributed about Cambridge, and eventually Oxford, as manuscripts or lecture notes that were not published until some time later (for example The Blue and Brown Books (1958) and the seminal Philosophical Investigations (1953)).

These ‘Wittgensteinians’ developed and propounded certain ideas and views, and indeed arguments and theories that Wittgenstein himself may not have approved (nor did Wittgenstein himself ever accept any label for his work, let alone ‘Ordinary Language’ philosophy). The Wittgensteinians saw themselves as developing and extending Wittgenstein’s views, despite the fact that the key principle in Wittgenstein’s work (both earlier and later) was that philosophical ‘theses’, as such, cannot be stated. Wittgenstein steadfastly denied that his work amounted to a philosophical theory because, according to him, philosophy cannot ‘explain’ anything; it may only ‘describe’ what is anyway the case (Philosophical Investigations, section 126-128). The Wittgensteinians developed more explicit arguments that tried to explain and justify the method of appeal to ordinary language than did Wittgenstein. Nevertheless, it is possible to understand what they were doing as remaining faithful to the Wittgensteinian tenet that one cannot propound philosophical theses insofar as claims about meaning are not in themselves theses about meaning. Indeed, the view was that the appeal to the ordinary uses of language is an act of reminding us of how some term or expression is used anyway – to show its meaning rather than explain it.

The first stirrings of the Ordinary Language views emerged as a reaction against the prevailing Logical Atomist, and later, Logical Positivist views that had been initially (ironically) developed by Wittgenstein himself, and published in his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus in 1921. In order to understand this reaction, we must take a brief look at the development of Ideal Language philosophy, which formed the background against which Ordinary Language philosophy arose.

a. Analysis and Formal Logic

Around the turn of the 20th century, in the earliest days of the development of Analytic philosophy, Russell and Moore (in particular) developed the methods of ‘analysis’ of problematic notions. These methods involved, roughly, ‘re-writing’ a philosophically problematic term or expression so as to render it ‘clearer’, or less problematic, in some sense. This itself involved a focus on language – or on the ‘proposition’ – as part of the methodology of philosophy, which was quite new at the time.

This new spirit of precision and rigor paid particular attention to Gottlob Frege’s groundbreaking work in formal logic (1879), which initiated the development of the truth-functional view of language. A logical system is truth-functional if all its sentential operators (words such as ‘and’, ‘or’, ‘not’ and ‘if…then’) are functions that take truth-values as arguments and yield truth-values as their output. The conception of a truth-functional language is deeply connected with that of the truth-conditional conception of meaning for natural language. On this view, the truth-condition of a sentence is its meaning – it is that in virtue of which an expression has a meaning – and the meaning of a compound sentence is determined by the meanings of its constituent parts, that is the words that compose it. This is known as the principle of compositionality (see Davidson’s Philosophy of Language, section 1a, i).

Although formal symbolic logic was developed initially in order to analyze and explore the structure of arguments, in particular the structure of ‘validity’, its success soon led many to see applications for it within the realm of natural language. Specifically, the thought began to emerge that the logic that was being captured in ever more sophisticated systems of symbolic logic was the structure that is either actually hidden beneath natural, ordinary language, or it is the structure which, if not present in ordinary language, ought to be. What emerges in connection with the development of the truth-functional and truth-conditional view of language is the idea that the surface form of propositions may not represent their ‘true’ (or truth-functional) logical form. Indeed, Russell’s ‘On Denoting’ in 1905, which proposed a thesis called the Theory of Descriptions, argues just that: that underlying the surface grammar of ordinary expressions was a distinct logical form. His method of the ‘logical analysis of language’, based on the attempt to ‘analyze’ (or ‘re-write’) the propositions of ordinary language into the propositions of an ideal language, became known as the ‘paradigm of philosophy’ (as described by Ramsey in his 1931, pp. 321).

Both Russell and Frege recognized that natural language did not always, on the surface at any rate, behave like symbolic logic. Its elementary propositions, for example, were not always determinately true or false; some were not truth-functional, or compositional, at all (such as those in ‘opaque contexts’ like “Mary believes she has a little lamb”) and so on. In ‘On Denoting’ Russell proposed that despite misleading surface appearances, many (ideally, all) of the propositions of ordinary language could nevertheless be rewritten as transparently truth-functional propositions (that is, those that can be the arguments of truth-functions, and whose values are determinately either true or false, as given by their truth-conditions). That is, he argued, they could be ‘analyzed’ in such a way as to reveal the true logical form of the proposition, which may be obscured beneath the surface grammatical form of the proposition.

The proposition famously treated to Russell’s logical analysis in ‘On Denoting’ is the following: “The present King of France is bald.” We do not know how to treat this proposition truth-functionally if there is no present King of France – it does not have a clear truth-value in this case. But all propositions that can be the arguments of truth-functions must be determinately either true or false. The surface grammar of the proposition appears to claim of some object X, that it is bald. Therefore, it would appear that the proposition is true or false depending on whether X is bald or not bald. But there is no X. Russell’s achievement lies in his analysis of this proposition in (roughly and non-symbolically) the following way, which rendered it truth-functional (such that the truth-value of the whole is a function of the truth-values of the parts) after all: instead of “The present King of France is bald,” we read (or analyze the proposition as) “There is one, and only one, object X such that X is the present King of France (and) X is bald.” Now the proposition is comprised of elementary propositions governed by an existential quantifier (plus a ‘connective’– the word ‘and’), which can now be treated perfectly truth-functionally, and can return a determinately true or false value. Since the elementary proposition that claims that there is such an X is straightforwardly false, then by the rules of the propositional calculus this renders the entire complex proposition straightforwardly false. This had the result that it was no longer necessary to agonize over whether something that does not exist can be bald or not!

b. Logical Atomism

To the view that logical analysis would reveal a ‘logically perfect’ truth-functional language that lurked beneath ordinary language (but was obscured by it), Russell added that the most elementary constituents of the true logical form of a proposition (‘logical atoms’) correspond with the most elementary constituents of reality. This combination of views constituted his Logical Atomism (for more detail see Analytic Philosophy, section 2d). According to Russell, the simple parts of propositions represent the simple parts of the world. And just as more complex propositions are built up out of simpler ones, so the complex facts and objects in reality are built up out of simpler ones (Russell 1918).

Thus, the notion of the ‘true logical form’ of propositions was not only thought to be useful for working out how arguments functioned, and whether they were valid, but for a wider metaphysical project of representing how the world really is. The essence of Russellian Logical Atomism is that once we analyze language into its true logical form, we can simply read off from it the ultimate ontological structure of reality. The basic assumption at work here, which formed the foundation for the Ideal Language view, is that the essential and fundamental purpose of language is to represent the world. Therefore, the more ‘perfect’, that is ‘ideal’, the language, the more accurately it represents the world. A logically perfect language is, on this line of thought, a literal mirror of metaphysical reality. Russell’s work encouraged the view that language is meaningful in virtue of this underlying representational and truth-functional nature.

The Ideal Language view gave weight to the growing suspicion that ordinary language actually obscured our access to reality, because it obscured true logical form. Perhaps, the thought went, ordinary language does not represent the world as it really is. For example, the notion of a non-existent entity, suggested in the proposition about ‘the present King of France’ was simply one which arose because of the misleading surface structure of ordinary language, which, when properly ‘analyzed’, revealed there was no true ontological commitment to such a paradoxical entity at all.

Wittgenstein, in his Tractatus, took these basic ideas of Logical Atomism to a more sophisticated level, but also provided the materials for the development of the views by the Logical Positivists. An ideal language, according to Wittgenstein, was understood to actually share a structure with metaphysical reality. On this view, between language and reality there was not mere correspondence of elements, but isomorphism of form – reality shares the ‘logical form’ of language, and is pictured in it. Wittgenstein’s version of Atomism became known as the ‘picture theory’ of language, and ultimately became the focus of the view he later rejected. A rather confounding part of Wittgenstein’s argument in the Tractatus is that although this picturing relation between reality and language exists, it cannot itself be represented, and nor therefore spoken of in language. Thus, according to Wittgenstein, the entire Tractatus attempts to say what cannot be said, and is therefore a form of ‘nonsense’ – once its lessons are absorbed, he advised, it must then be rejected, like a ladder to be kicked away once one has stepped up it to one’s destination (1921, section 6.54).

c. Logical Positivism and Ideal Language

The Vienna Circle, where the doctrine of Logical Positivism (or ‘Logical Empiricism’ as it was sometimes called) was developed, included philosophers such as Schlick, Waismann, Neurath, and Carnap, amongst others. (See Coffa 1991, chapter 13 for an authoritative history of this period in Vienna.) This group was primarily interested in the philosophy of science and epistemology. Unlike the Cambridge analysts, however, who merely thought metaphysics had to be done differently, that is more rigorously, the Logical Positivists thought it should not be done at all. They acquired this rejection of metaphysics from Wittgenstein’s Tractatus.

According to the Tractatus, properly meaningful propositions divided into two kinds only: ‘factual’ propositions which represented, or ‘pictured’, reality and the propositions of logic. The latter, although not meaningless, were nevertheless all tautologous – empty of empirical, factual content. The propositions that fell into neither of these classes – according to Wittgenstein, the propositions of his own Tractatus – were ‘meaningless’ nonsense because, he claimed, they tried to say what could not be said. The Positivists did not accept this part of Wittgenstein’s view however, that is that what defined ‘nonsense’ was trying to say what could not be said. What they did believe was that metaphysical (and other) propositions are nonsense because they cannot be confirmed – there exists no procedure by which they may be verified. For the Positivists, ‘pseudo-propositions’ are those which present themselves as if they were factual propositions, but which are, in fact, not. The proposition, for example, “All atomic propositions correspond to atomic facts” looks like a scientific, factual claim such as “All physical matter is composed of atoms.” But the propositions are not of the same order, according to the Positivists – the former is masquerading as a scientific proposition, but in fact, it is not the sort of proposition that we know how to confirm, or even test. The former has, according to the view, no ‘method of verification’.

Properly ‘empirical’ propositions are those, according to the Positivists, that are ‘about’ the world, they are ‘factual’, have ‘content’ and their truth-values are determined strictly by the way the world is; but most crucially, they can be confirmed or disconfirmed by empirical observation of the world (testing, experimenting, observing via instruments, and so forth). On the other hand, the ‘logical’ propositions, and any that could be reduced to logical propositions for example analytic propositions, were not ‘about’ anything: they determined the form of propositions and structured the body of the properly empirical propositions of science. The so-called ‘Empiricist Theory of Meaning’ is, thus, the view that ‘the meaning of a proposition is its method of verification’, and the so-called ‘Verification Principle’ is the doctrine that if a proposition cannot be empirically verified, and it is not, or is not reducible to, a logical proposition, it is therefore meaningless (see Carnap 1949, pp. 119).

Logical Positivism cemented the Ideal Language view insofar as it accepted all of the elements we have identified; the view that ordinary language is misleading, and that underlying the vagueness and opacity of ordinary language is a precise and perspicuous language that is truth-functional and truth-conditional. From these basic ideas emerged the notion that a meaningful language is meaningful in virtue of having a systematic, and thus formalizable syntactic and semantic structure, which, although it is often obscured in ordinary language, could be revealed with proper philosophical and logical analysis.

It is in opposition to this overall picture that Ordinary Language philosophy arose. Ideal language came to be seen as thoroughly misleading as to the true structure of reality. As Alice Ambrose (1950) noted, ideal language was by this time “…[condemned] as being seriously defective and failing to do what it is intended to do. [This view] gives rise to the idea that [ordinary] language is like a tailored suit that does not fit” (pp. 14-15). Contrary to this notion, according to Ambrose, ordinary language is the very paradigm of meaningfulness. Wittgenstein, for example, said in the Philosophical Investigations that,

On the one hand it is clear that every sentence in our language ‘is in order as it is’. That is to say, we are not striving after an ideal, as if our ordinary vague sentences had not yet got a quite unexceptionable sense, and a perfect language awaited construction by us. - On the other hand it seems clear that where there is sense there must be perfect order. - So there must be perfect order even in the vaguest sentence. (Section 98)

d. Ordinary Language versus Ideal Language

It is notable that, methodologically, Ideal and Ordinary Language philosophy both placed language at the center of philosophy, thus taking the so-called ‘linguistic turn’ (a term coined by Bergmann 1953, pp. 65) – which is to hold the rather more radical position that philosophical problems are (really) linguistic problems.

Certainly both the Ideal and Ordinary Language philosophers argued that philosophical problems arise because of the ‘misuses of language’, and in particular they were united against the metaphysical uses of language. Both complained and objected to what they called ‘pseudo-propositions’. Both saw such ‘misuses’ of language as the source of philosophical problems. But although the Positivists ruled out metaphysical (and many other non-empirically verifiable) uses of language as nonsense on the basis of the Verification Principle, the Ordinary Language philosophers objected to them as concealed non-ordinary uses of language – not to be ruled out, as such, so long as criteria for their use were provided.

The Positivists understood linguistic analysis as the weeding out of nonsense, such that a ‘logic of science’ could emerge (Carnap 1934). A ‘logic of science’ would be based on an ideal language – one which is of a perfectly perspicuous logical form, comprised exhaustively of factual propositions, logical propositions and nothing else. In such a language, philosophical problems would be eliminated because they could not even be formulated. On the other hand, for the Ordinary Language philosophers, the aim was to resolve philosophical confusion, but one could expect to achieve a kind of philosophical enlightenment, or certainly a greater understanding of ourselves and the world, in the process of such resolution: for philosophy is seen as an ongoing practice without an ultimate end-game.

Most strikingly, however, is the difference in the views about linguistic meaning between the Ideal and Ordinary Language philosophers. As we’ve seen, the Ideal language view maintains a truth-functional and representational theory of meaning. The Ordinary Language philosophers held, following Wittgenstein, a use-based theory (or just a ‘use-theory’) of meaning. The exact workings of such a theory have never been fully detailed, but we turn to examine what we can of it below (section 3a). Suffice it to say here that, for the Ordinary Language philosopher, no proposition falls into a class – say ‘empirical’, ‘logical’, ‘necessary’, ‘contingent’ or ‘analytic’ or ‘synthetic’ and so forth in and of itself. That is, it is not, on a use-theory of meaning, the content of a proposition that marks it as belonging to such categories, but the way it is used in the language. (For more on this aspect of a use-theory, see for example Malcolm 1940; 1951.)

3. Ordinary Language Philosophy: Nothing is Hidden

The Ordinary Language philosophers, did not, strictly speaking, ‘reject’ metaphysics (to deny the existence of a metaphysical realm is itself, notice, a metaphysical contention). Rather, they ‘objected’ to metaphysical theorizing for two reasons. Firstly, because they believed it distorted the ordinary use of language, and this distortion was itself a source of philosophical problems. Secondly, they argued that metaphysical theorizing was superfluous to our philosophical needs – metaphysics was, basically, thought to be beside the point. Both objections rested on the view that our ordinary perceptions of the world, and our ordinary use of language to talk about them, are all we need to observe in order to dissipate philosophical perplexity. On this view, metaphysics adds nothing, but poses the danger of distorting what the issues really are. This position rests on Wittgenstein’s insistence that ‘nothing is hidden’.

Wittgenstein’s view was that whatever philosophy does, it simply describes what is open to view to anyone. Philosophy is not, on this approach, a matter of theorizing about ‘how reality really is’ and then confirming such philosophical ‘facts’ – generally, not obvious to everyday experience – through special philosophical techniques, such as analysis. Philosophy is, thus, quite distinct from the empirical sciences – as the Positivists agreed. For Ordinary Language philosophy, however, the distinction did not rest on issues of verification, but on the view that philosophy is a practice rather than an accumulation of knowledge or the discovery of new, special philosophical facts. This runs contrary to the traditional, ‘metaphysical’ view that ‘reality’ is somehow hidden, or underlies the familiar, the everyday reality we experience and must be ‘revealed’ or ‘discovered’ by some special philosophical kind of study or analysis. On the contrary Wittgenstein claimed:

Philosophy simply puts everything before us, and neither explains nor deduces anything.  – Since everything lies open to view there is nothing to explain. (Section 126)

…For nothing is hidden. (Section 435)

Metaphysical theorizing requires that language be used in ways that it is not ordinarily used, according to Wittgenstein, and the task proper to philosophy is to simply remind us what the ordinary uses actually are:

…We must do away with all explanation, and description alone must take its place. And this description gets its light, that is to say its purpose, from the philosophical problems. These are, of course, not empirical problems; they are solved rather by looking into the workings of our language, and that in such a way as to make us recognise these workings; in despite of an urge to misunderstand them. The problems are solved, not by giving new information, but by arranging what we have always known. Philosophy is a battle against the bewitchment of our intelligence by means of language. (Section 109)

What we do is bring words back from their metaphysical to their everyday use. (Section 116)

The idea that philosophical problems could be dissolved by means of the observation of the ordinary uses of language was referred to, mostly derogatively, by its critics as ‘therapeutic positivism’ (see the critical papers by Farrell 1946a and 1946b). It is true that the notion of ‘philosophy as therapy’ is to be found in the texts of Wittgenstein (1953, Section 133) and particularly in Wisdom (1936; 1953). However, the idea of philosophy as therapy was not an idea that was taken too kindly by traditional philosophers. The method was referred to by Russell as “…procurement by theft of what one has failed to gain by honest toil” (quoted in Rorty 1992, pp. 3). This view of philosophy was marked as a kind of ‘quietism’ about the real philosophical problems (a stubborn refusal to address them), and even as a kind of ‘nihilism’ about the prospects of philosophy altogether (once ‘misuses’ of language have been revealed, philosophical problems would disappear). It was only later at Oxford that Ordinary Language philosophy was eventually able to shrug off the association with the view that philosophical perplexity is a ‘disease’ that needed to be ‘cured’.

In the following sections, four important aspects of early Ordinary Language philosophy are examined, along with some of the key objections.

a. The Misuses of Language

In examining the view that metaphysics leads to the distortion of the ordinary uses of language, the question must also be answered as to why this was supposed to be a negative thing – since that is not at all obvious. An account is required of what the Ordinary Language philosophers counted as ‘ordinary’ uses of language, as non-ordinary uses, and why the latter was thought to be the source of philosophical problems, rather than elements of their solution.

The question of what counts as ‘ordinary’ language has been a pivotal point of objection to Ordinary Language philosophy from its earliest days. Some attempts were made by Ryle to get clearer on the matter (see 1953; 1957; 1961). For example, he emphasized, as we noted in the introduction, that it is not words that are of interest, but their uses:

Hume’s question was not about the word ‘cause’; it was about the use of ‘cause’. It was just as much about the use of ‘Ursache’. For the use of ‘cause’ is the same as the use of ‘Ursache’, though ‘cause’ is not the same word as ‘Ursache’. (1953, pp. 28)

He emphasized that the issue was ‘the ordinary use of language’ and not ‘the use of ordinary language’. Malcolm described the notion of the ordinary use of some expression thus:

By an “ordinary expression” I mean an expression which has an ordinary use, i.e. which is ordinarily used to describe a certain sort of situation. By this I do not mean that the expression need be one that is frequently used. It need only be an expression which would be used… To be an ordinary expression it must have a commonly accepted use; it need not be the case that it is ever used. (1942a, pp. 16)

The uses of expressions in question here refer almost entirely to what would ordinarily be said of some situation or state of affairs; what we (language users) would ordinarily call it a case of. So, of interest are the states of affairs that come under philosophical dispute, for example cases which we would ordinarily call cases of, say ‘free-will’, cases of ‘seeing some object’, cases of ‘knowing something for certain’ and so forth. It was Malcolm who, in his 1942a paper, first pointed out that non-ordinary uses of expressions occur in philosophy most particularly when the philosophical thesis propounded ‘goes against ordinary language’ – that is, when what the philosophical thesis proposes to be the case is radically different from what we would ordinarily say about some case (1942a, pp. 8).

To illustrate, take the term ‘knowledge’. According to Malcolm, its use in epistemological skepticism is non-ordinary. If one uttered “I do not know if this is a desk before me,” a hearer may assume that what is meant is that the utterer is unsure about the object before her because, for example the light is bad, or she thinks it might be a dining table instead of a desk or something similar. Something like this would be the, let us say, ordinary use of the term ‘know’. By way of contrast, if the utterer meant, by the expression, ‘I do not know if this is a desk before me, because I do not know the truth of any material-object statement, or I do not know if any independent objects exist outside my mind’ – then, we might say this was a non-ordinary use of the term ‘know’. We have not established that the non-ordinary use is at any disadvantage as yet. However, since if the latter was what one meant when one uttered the original statement, then one would have to explain this use to a hearer (unless the philosophical use was established to be in play at an earlier moment) – that is, one would have to note that “I do not know if this is a desk before me” is being used in a different sense to the other (non-skeptical) one. On this basis, the claim is that the first use is ordinary and the second, non-ordinary. Minimally, the expressions have different uses, and thus different senses, on this argument.

It might be objected that the skeptical use is perfectly ordinary – say, amongst philosophers at least. However, this does not establish that the skeptical use is the ordinary use, because the skeptical use depends on the prior existence, and general acceptance, of the original use. That is, the skeptical claim about knowledge could not even be formulated if it were not assumed that everyone knew the ordinary meaning of the term ‘know’ – if this were not assumed, there would be no point in denying that we have ‘knowledge’ of material-object propositions. Indeed, Ryle noted his sense of this paradox quite early on:

…if the expressions under consideration [in philosophical arguments] are intelligently used, their employers must always know what they mean and do not need the aid or admonition of philosophers before they can understand what they are saying. And if their hearers understand what they are being told, they too are in no such perplexity that they need to have this meaning philosophically “analysed” or “clarified” for them. And, at least, the philosopher himself must know what the expressions mean, since otherwise, he could not know what it was that he was analysing. (1992, pp. 85)

Often, the ordinary use of some expression must be presupposed in order to formulate the philosophical position in which it is used non-ordinarily.

Nevertheless, challenges to the very idea of ordinary versus non-ordinary uses of language came from other quarters. In particular, a vigorous dispute arose over what the criteria were supposed to be to identify ordinary versus non-ordinary uses of language, and why a philosopher assumes herself to have any authority on this matter. For example, Benson Mates argued, in his ‘On the Verifiability of Statements about Ordinary Language’ (1958, 1964) just what the title suggests: how can any such claims be confirmed? This objection applies more seriously to the later Ordinary Language philosophical work, because that period focused on far more detailed analyses of the uses of expressions, and made rather more sweeping claims about ‘what we say’. Stanley Cavell (1958, 1964) responded to Mates that claims as to the ordinary uses of expressions are not empirically based, but are normative claims (that is, they are not, in general, claims about what people do say, but what they can say, or ought to say, within the bounds of the meaning of the expression in question). Cavell also argued that the philosopher, as a member of a linguistic community, was at least as qualified as any other member of that community to make claims about what is, or can be, ordinarily said and meant; although it is always possible that any member of the linguistic community may be wrong in such a claim. The debate has continued, however, with similar objections (to Mates’) raised by Fodor and Katz (1963, 1971), to which Henson (1965) has responded.

The reason this objection applies less-so to the early Ordinary Language philosophers is that, for the Wittgensteinians, claims as to what is ‘ordinarily said’ applied in much more general ways. It applied, for example, to ‘what would ordinarily be said of, for example, a situation’ – for example, as we noted, cases of what we ordinarily call ‘seeing x’, or ‘doing x of her own free-will’, or ‘knowing “x” for certain’ and so forth (these kinds of cases were later argued to be paradigm cases – see below, section 3d, for a discussion of this important argument within early Ordinary Language philosophy). The Wittgensteinians were originally making their points against the kind of skeptical metaphysical views which had currency in their own time; the kinds of theories which suggested such things as ‘we do not know the truth of any material-thing statements’, ‘we are acquainted, in perception, only with sense-data and not external, independent objects’, ‘no sensory experience can be known for certain’ and so on. In such cases there is no question that the ordinary thing to say is, for example “I am certain this is a desk before me,” and “I see the fire-engine” and “It is true that I know that this is a desk” and so forth. In fact, in such disputes it was generally agreed that there was a certain ordinary way of describing such and such a situation. This would be how a situation is identified, so that the metaphysician or skeptical philosopher could proceed to suggest that this way of describing things is false.

The objection that was directed equally at the Wittgensteinians and the Oxford Ordinary Language philosophers was in regard to what was claimed to count as ‘misuses’ of expressions, particularly philosophical ‘misuses’. In particular, it was objected that presumably such uses must be banned according to Ordinary Language philosophy (for example Rollins 1951). Sometimes, it was argued, the non-ordinary use of some expression is philosophically necessary since sometimes technical or more precise terms are needed.

In fact, it was never argued by the Ordinary Language philosophers that any term or use of an expression should be prohibited. The objection is not born out by the actual texts. It was not argued that non-ordinary uses of language in and of themselves were a cause of philosophical problems; the problem lay in, mostly implicitly, attempting to pass them off as ordinary uses. The non-ordinary use of some term or expression is not, merely, a more ‘technical’ or more ‘precise’ use of the term – it is to introduce, or even assume, a quite different meaning for the term. In this sense, a philosophical theory that uses some term or expression non-ordinarily is talking about something entirely different to whatever the term or expression talks about in its ordinary use. Malcolm, for example, argues that the problem with philosophical uses of language is that they are often introduced into discussion without being duly noted as non-ordinary uses. Take, for example, the metaphysical claim that the content of assertions about experiences of an independent realm of material objects can never be certain. The argument (see Malcolm 1942b) is that this is an implicit suggestion that we stop applying the term ‘certain’ to empirical propositions, and reserve it for the propositions of logic or mathematics (which can be exhaustively proven to be true). It is a covert suggestion about how to reform the use of the term ‘certain’. But the suggested use is a ‘misuse’ of language, on the Ordinary Language view (that is, applying the term ‘certain’ only to mathematical or logical propositions). Moreover, the argument presents itself as an argument about the facts concerning the phenomenon of certainty, thus failing to ‘own up’ to being a suggestion about the use of the term ‘certain’ - leaving the assumption that it uses the term according to its ordinary meaning misleadingly in place. The issue, according to Ordinary Language philosophy, is that the two uses of ‘certain’ are distinct and the philosopher’s sense cannot replace the ordinary sense – though it can be introduced independently and with its own criteria, if that can be provided. Malcolm says, for example:

…if it gives the philosopher pleasure always to substitute the expression “I see some sense-data of my wife” for the expression “I see my wife,” etc.and so forth, then he is at liberty thus to express himself, provided he warns people beforehand, so that they will understand him. (1942a, pp. 15)

In an argument Malcolm elsewhere (1951) deals with, he suggests that it is not a ‘correct’ use of language to say, “I feel hot, but I am not certain of it.” But this is not to suggest that the expression must be banned from philosophical theorizing, nor that it is not possible that it might, at some point, become a perfectly correct use of language. What is crucial is that, for any use newly introduced to a language, how that expression is to be used must be explained, that is, criteria for its use must be provided. He says:

We have never learned a usage for a sentence of the sort “I thought that I felt hot but it turned out that I was mistaken.” In such matters we do not call anything “turning out that I was mistaken.” If someone were to insist that it is quite possible that I were mistaken when I say that I feel hot, then I should say to him: Give me a use for those words! I am perfectly willing to utter them, provided that you tell me under what conditions I should say that I was or was not mistaken.  Those words are of no use to me at present. I do not know what to do with them…There is nothing we call “finding out whether I feel hot.” This we could term either a fact of logic or a fact of language. (1951, pp. 332)

Malcolm went so far as to suggest the laws of logic may well, one day, be different to what we accept now (1940, pp. 198), and that we may well reject some necessary statements, should we find a use for their negation, or for treating them as contingent (1940, pp. 201ff). Thus, the objection that, according to Ordinary Language philosophy, non-ordinary uses, or new, revised or technical uses of expressions are to be prohibited from philosophy is generally unfounded – though it is an interpretation of Ordinary Language philosophy that survives into the present day.

b. Philosophical Disputes and Linguistic Disputes

There was no lack of voluble objection to the claim that philosophical disputes are ‘really linguistic’ (or sometimes ‘really verbal’). Therefore, it is essential to understand the Ordinary Language philosophers’ reasons for holding it to be true (although the later Oxford philosophers were generally less committed to it in quite such a rigid form). One of the most explicit formulations of this view is, once again, to be found in Malcolm’s 1942a paper. Its rough outline is this: in certain philosophical disputes the empirical facts of the matter are not at issue – that is to say, the dispute is not based on any lack of access to the empirical facts, the kinds of fact we can, roughly, ‘observe’. If the dispute is not about the empirical facts according to Malcolm, then the only other thing that could be at issue is how some phenomenon is to be described - and that is a ‘linguistic’ issue. This is particularly true of metaphysical disputes, according to Malcolm, who presents as examples the following list of ‘metaphysical’ propositions’ (1942a, pp. 6):

1. There are no material things

2. Time is unreal

3. Space is unreal

4. No-one ever perceives a material thing

5. No material thing exists unperceived

6. All that one ever sees when he looks at a thing is part of his own brain

7. There are no other minds – my sensations are the only sensations that exist

8. We do not know for certain that there are any other minds

9. We do not know for certain that the world was not created five minutes ago

10. We do not know for certain the truth of any statement about material things

11. All empirical statements are hypotheses

12. A priori statements are rules of grammar

According to Malcolm, affirming or denying the truth of any one of these propositions is not affirming or denying a matter of fact, but rather, Malcolm claims, “…it is a dispute over what language shall be used to describe those facts” (1942a, pp. 9). On what basis does he make this claim? The obvious objection on behalf of the metaphysician is that she certainly is talking about ‘the facts’ here, namely the metaphysical facts, and not about language at all.

Malcolm argues thus: he imagines a dispute between Russell and Moore, as illustrated by the propositions noted above. He takes as an example Russell’s assertion that “All that one ever sees when one looks at a thing is part of one’s own brain”. This is the sort of proposition that would follow from the philosophical thesis that all we are acquainted with in perception is sense-data, and that we do not perceive independent, external objects directly (See Russell 1927, pp. 383 – see also Sense-Data). Malcolm casts Moore (unauthorized by Moore it should be noted) as replying to Russell: “This desk which both of us now see is most certainly not part of my brain, and, in fact, I have never seen a part of my own brain” (Malcolm 1942a, pp. 7). We are asked to notice that there is no disagreement, in Russell and Moore’s opposing propositions, about the empirical facts of the matter. The dispute is not that one of either Russell or Moore cannot see the desk properly, or is hallucinating, in disagreeing whether what is before them is, or is not, a desk. That is, Russell and Moore agree that the phenomenon they are talking about is the one that is ordinarily described by saying (for example) “I see before me a desk.”

Malcolm asserts that “Both the philosophical statement, and Moore’s reply to it are disguised linguistic statements” (1942a, pp. 13 – my italics). Malcolm’s claim that this kind of dispute is not ‘empirical’ has less to do with a Positivistically construed notion of ‘verifiability’, and more to do with the contrast such a dispute has with a kind of dispute that really is empirical, or ‘factual’ – in the ordinary sense, where getting a closer look, say, at something would resolve the issue. The argument that the dispute is ‘really linguistic’ rests on Malcolm’s claim that when a philosophical thesis denies the applicability of some ordinary use of language, it is not merely suggesting that, occasionally, when we make certain claims, what we say is false. According to Malcolm, when a philosophical thesis suggests (implicitly), for example, that we should withhold the term ‘certain’ from non-analytic (mathematical or logical) statements, the suggestion is not that it is merely false to say one is certain about a synthetic (material-thing) statement – but that it is logically impossible. Malcolm tries to support his contention by drawing attention to the features apparent in the sort of dispute that is really about ‘the facts’, and one that he regards as, rather, really linguistic:

In ordinary life everyone of us has known of particular cases in which a person has said that he knew for certain that some material-thing statement was true, but that it has turned out that he was mistaken. Someone may have said, for example, that he knew for certain by the smell that it was carrots that were cooking on the stove. But you had just previously lifted the cover and seen that it was turnips, not carrots. You are able to say, on empirical grounds, that in this particular case when the person said that he knew for certain that a material-thing statement was true, he was mistaken…It is an empirical fact that sometimes when people use statements of the form: “I know for certain that p”, where p is a material-thing statement, what they say is false. But when the philosopher asserts that we never know for certain any material-thing statements, he is not asserting this empirical fact…he is asserting that always…when any person says a thing of that sort his statement will be false. (1942a, pp. 11)

So, Malcolm proposes that, since their dispute is not empirical, or contingent, we ought to understand Russell as saying that “…it is really a more correct way of speaking to say that you see part of your brain than to say that you see [for example] a desk” and we have Moore saying that, on the contrary, “It is correct language to say that what we are doing now is seeing [a desk], and it is not correct language to say that what we are doing now is seeing parts of our brains” (1942a, pp. 9).

The obvious objection here is to the claim that the dispute is linguistic rather than about the phenomenon of, for example perception itself. For example, C. A. Campbell (1944) remarks that: seems perfectly clear that what [these] arguments [such as the one’s mentioned by Malcolm] [are] concerned with is the proper understanding of the facts of the situation, and not with any problem of linguistics: and that there is a disagreement about language with the plain man only because there is a disagreement about the correct reading of the facts...The philosopher objects to such [ordinary] statements   only in the context of philosophical discourse where it is vital that our words should accurately describe the facts. (pp. 15)

This objection is further echoed in Morris Weitz (1947), responding to Malcolm’s Ordinary Language treatment of the propositions of epistemic skepticism, such as “no-material thing statement is known for certain”:

The first thing that needs to be pointed out is that philosophers who recommend the abolition of the prefix ‘it is certain that’ as applied to empirical statements do not suggest that the language of common sense is mistaken.  What they mean to say to common sense is that its language is alright provided that its interpretation of the facts is all right. But the interpretation is not all right; therefore, the articulation of the interpretation is mistaken, and needs revision. [Thus]...will we not, and more correctly say, common sense and its language are here in error and....incline a little with Broad to the view that common sense, at least on this issue, ought to go out and hang itself. (pp. 544-545)

A more contemporary version of this objection, which applies to the idea that philosophical disputes are about concepts and thoughts (rather than the ordinary uses of language) may be found in Williamson (2007). He argues that not all philosophy is (the equivalent of) ‘linguistic’, because philosophers may well study objects that have never (as yet) been thought or spoken about at all (‘elusive objects’). He says:

Suppose, just for the sake of argument, that there are no [such] elusive objects. That by itself would still not vindicate a restriction of philosophy to the conceptual, the realm of sense or thought. The practitioners of any discipline have thoughts and communicate them, but they are rarely studying those very thoughts: rather, they are studying what their thoughts are about. Most thoughts are not about thoughts. To make philosophy the study of thought is to insist that philosophers’ thoughts should be about thoughts. It is not obvious why philosophers should accept that restriction. (pp. 17-18)

The general gist of the objection was that philosophy is just as perfectly the study of facts as any other science, except what is under investigation are metaphysical rather than physical facts. There is no reason, on this objection, to understand metaphysical claims as claims about language. The early Ordinary Language philosophers did not formulate a complete response to this charge. Indeed, that the charge is still being raised demonstrates that it still has not been answered to the satisfaction of its critics. Some attempts were made to emphasize, for example, that an inquiry about how some X is to be described ought not be distinguished from an inquiry into the nature of X (for example Austin 1964; Cavell 1958, pp. 91; McDowell 1994, pp. 27) – given that we have no obviously independent way to study such ‘natures’. This appears not to have convinced those who disagree, however.

It was also part of a defence to this objection to appeal to the so-called ‘linguistic doctrine of necessity’. The terminology popular in the day is partly to blame for the general disdain of this view (which was only a ‘doctrine’ as such in the hands of the Positivists), as it sounds as though the claim is that necessary propositions, because they are ‘linguistic’, are not to be understood as being about the world and the way things are in it, but about words, or even about the ways words are used. This of course would have the result that necessary propositions turn out to be contingent propositions about language use, which was correctly recognised to be absurd (as noted in Malcolm 1940, pp. 190-191). This was rather more how the Positivists described the doctrine. For them, the thought in distinguishing ‘linguistic’ from ‘factual’ propositions was that the former are ‘rules of language’, and therefore truth-valueless, or ‘non-cognitive’. But on the Ordinary Language philosophers’ view, necessary propositions are not (disguised) assertions about the uses of words, they are ‘about’ the world just as all propositions are (and so are perfectly ‘cognitive’ bearers of truth-values). On the other hand, what makes them count as necessary, what justifies us in holding them to be so, is not any special metaphysical fact; only the ordinary empirical fact that this is how some of the propositions of language are used. (op.cit. 1940, pp. 192; 1942b) On this view, it is through linguistic practice that we establish the distinction between necessary and contingent propositions. We have met this idea already in some preliminary remarks about a use-theory of meaning (in section 2d above).

However, even on the more amenable use-based interpretation of the linguistic doctrine of necessity, metaphysicians still wish to insist that some necessities are, indeed, metaphysical, and not connected with the uses of propositions at all – for example, that nothing is both red and green all over, that a circle cannot be squared, and so forth. Thus, the objection persists that in philosophy what one is doing is inquiring into facts, that is, the nature of phenomena, the general structure and fundamental ontology of reality, and not at all the meanings of the expressions we use to describe them. Indeed, it seems to be the most prevalent and recurrent complaint against ‘linguistic’ philosophy, and it seems to be an argument in which neither side will be convinced by the other, and thus one that will probably go on indefinitely. At least one question that has not fully entered the debate is why a ‘linguistic’ problem is understood to be so philosophically inferior to a metaphysical one.

c. Ordinary Language is Correct Language

The contention ‘ordinary language is correct language’ forms the rationale, or justification, for the method of the appeal to ordinary language. This is a basic and fundamental tenet on which it is safe to say all Ordinary Language philosophers concur, more or less strongly. However, it has been often misunderstood, and the misunderstanding has unfortunately in part been attributable to the early Ordinary Language philosophers. The misunderstanding lies in conflating the notion of ‘correctness’ with the notion of ‘truth’. It appears that the Ordinary Language philosophers themselves did not always make this distinction clearly enough, nor did they always adhere to it, as we shall see below. We shall examine one formulation of the argument to the conclusion that ‘ordinary language is correct language’, and see that it need not be (as it very often has been) understood as a claim that what is said in the ordinary use of language must thereby be true (or its converse: that whatever is said in using language non-ordinarily must thereby be false).

The latter interpretation of Ordinary Language philosophy was, and is, widespread. For example, Chisholm, in 1951, devoted a paper to rejecting the claim that “Any philosophical statement which violates ordinary language is false” (pp. 175). The converse, that any statement which is in accord with ordinary language is true is a version of what came to be known as the ‘paradigm case argument’, which we shall examine in the following section.

Once again, the classic formulation of the argument to the conclusion that ‘ordinary language is correct’ is to be found in Malcolm’s 1942a paper. His argument is roughly this: not only are metaphysical philosophical disputes not based on any facts, but metaphysical claims are, generally, claims to necessary rather than ordinary, contingent truth (that is, a philosophical thesis does not claim that sometimes we cannot be certain of a material-thing statement, for that is perfectly true and we all know this; rather the philosophical thesis says that it is never the case that such statements are certain). We should note that it is at least debatable whether a metaphysical thesis might be presented as contingent (See article on Modal Illusions). Certainly for the most part, metaphysical theses are presented as necessary truths, as there are separate difficulties in doing otherwise. Malcolm’s argument is that these metaphysical theses, which contradict the ordinary uses of language, have the semantic consequence that the ordinary uses of expressions fail to express anything at all.

No metaphysician would argue for this explicitly. Indeed, most suggest that the ordinary expression they contest, or that is ultimately contested by their thesis, is ‘just wrong’, that is, merely false. The thought is that the folk get certain things wrong all the time and need to be corrected: the empirical sciences are the model here. But the analogy with science is misleading, since science only shows us that certain ways we describe things may turn out to be contingently false. But, if the metaphysically necessary propositions in question turn out to be true, that is, the ones that are inconsistent with ordinary language, the result is not that our ordinary ways of describing certain phenomena or situations turn out to be merely false. Rather, our ordinary uses of language would turn out to express that which is necessarily false – they would express, or try to express, that which is metaphysically impossible.

According to Malcolm, the implication that what is expressed in certain ordinary uses of language is necessarily false, or metaphysically impossible, renders those uses ‘self-contradictory’ (1942a, pp. 11). What he means is this: if it turns out that, say, the proposition “One never perceives a material object” is true, then because it is necessarily true, it is therefore impossible (for us) to perceive a material object. Therefore, material objects are (for us) imperceptible. So, to assert “I perceive a material object” is not merely to state a falsehood (like saying “The earth is flat”), but to state something like “I perceive something that is imperceptible.” If a metaphysical thesis is necessarily true, and it contradicts what would be said ordinarily, then the latter is necessarily false, and to assert a necessarily false proposition is to fail to assert anything at all. Failing to assert anything, in the utterance of an assertion, is to fail to use the language correctly – and this is the implicit upshot of some metaphysical theses.

On the contrary, Malcolm claims, such a misuse of language is impossible, because “The proposition that no ordinary expression is self-contradictory is a tautology” (pp. 16 – my italics). This is not to say that whatever is said using language ordinarily is thereby actually true. Malcolm insists that there are two ways one can ‘go wrong’ in saying something; one way is to be wrong about the facts, the second way is to use language incorrectly. And so he notes that it is perfectly possible to be using language correctly, and yet state something that is plainly false. But, on this view, one cannot be uttering self-contradictions and at the same time be saying something true or false for that matter. The assertion of contradictions, according to this view, has no use for us in our language (so far at least), and therefore they have no meaning (clearly, this is an aspect of the use-theory of meaning at work). On the other hand, according to Malcolm, to have a use just is to have a meaning. Thus, any expression that does have a use cannot also be ‘meaningless’ – or self-contradictory. ‘Correct’ language, therefore, is language that is or would be used, and is therefore meaningful, on this argument. Given the nature of our language, we do not, as a matter of fact, use self-contradictory expressions to describe situations (literally, sincerely and non-metaphorically that is) – although we do say such things as “It is and it is not,” but we do not say of such uses that one is contradicting oneself (see Malcolm 1942a, pp. 16 for more on uttering contradictions). He says:

The reason that no ordinary expression is self-contradictory is that a self-contradictory expression is an expression which would never be used to describe any sort of situation. It does not have a descriptive usage. An ordinary expression is an expression which would be used to describe a certain sort of situation; and since it would be used to describe a certain sort of situation, it does describe that sort of situation. A self-contradictory expression, on the contrary, describes nothing. (1942a, pp. 16)

It is on the basis of this argument that Malcolm claims that Moore, in the imagined dispute with Russell, actually refutes the philosophical propositions in question - merely by pointing out that they do ‘go against ordinary language’ (1942a, pp. 5). It is here that we get some insight into why it was assumed that Ordinary Language philosophy argued that anything said in the non-ordinary use of language must be false (and anything said in ordinary language must be true): Malcolm after all does say that what Moore says refutes the skeptical claims and shows the falsity of the proposition in question.

However, it must be kept in mind that what Malcolm is claiming to be true and false here are the linguistic versions of the dispute: he claims that Moore’s assertion that “It is a correct use of language to say that ‘I am certain this is a desk before me’” is true – he does not argue that Moore has proven there is a desk before him. Moreover, the philosophical proposition Moore has proven to be false is not “No material-thing statement is known for certain,” but the claim that “It is not a correct use of language to say ‘I am certain this is a desk before me’.” What Malcolm has argued, even if he himself did not make this entirely clear (and perhaps even deliberately equivocated on), is that certain claims about what is a correct (ordinary) use of language are true or false. His is not an argument with metaphysical results, and he has not shown, through Moore, that any version of skepticism is false. Indeed, the metaphysical thesis itself is beside the point. If the skeptic insists that, although it may be an incorrect use of language to say “I am not certain that this is a desk before me,” it may nevertheless be true, then the onus is on the skeptic to explain why it is that our ordinary claims to ‘know’ such and such are, therefore, not merely contingently false, but necessarily false. By Malcolm’s lights, this would amount to the skeptic claiming that this particular part of our use of language, that is, that involving some ordinary claims to ‘know’ such and such, is self-contradictory; yet, for Malcolm, as we have seen, this is not possible, because ordinary language is correct language. At any rate, in assessing the Ordinary Language argument, it is clear that the claim that philosophical propositions are incorrect uses of language and the claim that what they express is false ought not be conflated.

Although Malcolm has not refuted the skeptic, he nevertheless has demonstrated that there are some semantic difficulties in formulating the skeptical thesis in the first place – since it requires the non-ordinary use of language. This places additional, hitherto unacknowledged constraints on certain skeptical and metaphysical theses. Either the skeptic/metaphysician must acknowledge the non-ordinary use of the expression in question, or she must argue that we must reform our ordinary use. In the first case, she must then acknowledge that her thesis concerns something other than what we are ordinarily talking about when we use the term in question (for example ‘know’, ‘perceive’, ‘certain’, and so forth). In the second case, she must convince us that our ordinary use of the expression has, hitherto unbeknownst to us, been a misuse of language: we have, up till now, been asserting something that is necessarily false. Someone, in the imagined philosophical dispute, is failing to use language correctly, or failing to express anything in their description of some phenomenon. The dilemma the skeptic faces is that neither of theses two possibilities is a comfortable one for her to explain, although maintaining the truth of her thesis. This dilemma creates a situation for the skeptic that, although not refuting her directly, poses a possibly insurmountable challenge to meaningfully formulating her thesis.

d. The Paradigm Case Argument

The so-called ‘paradigm-case argument’ generated a good deal of debate (for example Watkins 1957; Richman 1961; Flew 1966; Hanfling 1990). It plays a significant role in Ordinary Language philosophy, because it tends to be interpreted as the mistaken view that Ordinary Language philosophy contends that what is said in ordinary language must be true. This is a prime example, as will be shown, of conflating the claim that ordinary language is correct with the claim that what is expressed in the ordinary use of some expression is true.

It was understood that the paradigm-case argument was an argument that shows that there must be (at least some) true instances, in the actual and not merely possible world, of anything that is said (referred to) in ordinary language. For example, Roderick Chisholm (1951) says “There are words in ordinary language, Malcolm believes, whose use implies that they have a denotation. That is to say, from the fact that they are used in ordinary language, we may infer that there is something to which they truly apply” (pp. 180). On this interpretation, certain metaphysical truths, indeed empirical truths, could be proven simply by the fact that we use a certain expression ordinarily. This seems clearly an absurd position to take, and does not, once again, appear to be supported by the texts.

Malcolm invokes what is now known as the paradigm-case argument by reference to one of the outcomes on the assumption that the philosophical claims he is examining are true. If we consider, say, the thesis that “No-one ever knows for certain the truth of any material-thing statement” to be true, then on that theory it turns out that an ordinary expression such as “I am certain there is a chair in this room” is never true, no matter how good our evidence for the claim is – indeed, regardless of the evidence. Malcolm casts the ‘Moorean’ reply to such a view, that “[On the contrary] both of us know for certain there are several chairs in this room, and how absurd it would be to suggest that we do not know it, but only believe it, or that it is highly probable but not really certain!” (1942a, pp. 12) Malcolm says,

What [Moore’s] reply does is give us a paradigm of absolute certainty, just as in the case previously discussed his reply gave us a paradigm of seeing something not a part of one’s brain. What his reply does is to appeal to our language-sense; to make us feel how queer and wrong it would be to say, when we sat in a room seeing and touching chairs, that we believed there were chairs but did not know it for certain, or that it was only highly probable that there were chairs… Moore’s refutation consists simply in pointing out that [the expression “know for certain”] has an application to empirical statements. (1942a, pp. 13)

Here, he says nothing to the effect that Moore has proven that it is true that there are in fact chairs and tables before us, and so forth. All Malcolm has claimed is that Moore has denied, indeed disproven, the suggestion that the term ‘certainty’ has no application to empirical statements. He has disproven that by invoking examples where it is manifestly the case that the term ‘certainty’ has been, and can be, ‘applied’. Nothing, notice, has been said as to whether there really are tables, chairs and cheese before us - unless, that is, we confuse ‘having an application’ with ‘having a reference’ or ‘having a true application’. But it is not necessary to interpret the claims this way. ‘Having an application’ means, as Malcolm argues, having a use in a given situation. Malcolm’s example in the quote above is a ‘paradigm of absolute certainty’, but not, notice, a proof of what it is that one is certain of. It is a ‘paradigm of absolute certainty’ because it is a prime example of the sort of situation, or context in which the term ‘certain’ applies – it is a paradigm of the term’s use: namely, in situations where we have very good (though not infallible) evidence, and no reason to think that our evidence is not of the highest quality. Indeed, on Malcolm’s view, a ‘paradigm case’ is an example of the ordinary use and hence the ordinary meaning of an expression.

The point of appealing to paradigm cases, then, is not to guarantee the truth of ordinary expressions, but to demonstrate that they have a use in the language. Thus, the paradigm-case argument is an effective move against any view that implies that some ordinary expression does not have a use, or application – for example that what we call ‘certain’ (well-evidenced non-mathematical statements) are not ‘really’ certain. That the ordinary use of expressions should be incorrect is, on Malcolm’s argument, as impossible as it would be for the rules of chess to be incorrect (and therefore that what we play is not ‘really’ chess).

e. A Use-Theory of Linguistic Meaning

The ‘use-theory’ of meaning, whose source is Wittgenstein and which was adopted by the Ordinary Language philosophers, objects to the idea that language could be treated like a calculus, or an ‘ideal language’. If language is like a calculus, then its ‘meanings’ could be specified, so that determinate truth-conditions could be paired with every expression of a language in advance of, and independently of, any particular use of a term or expression in a speech-act. Therefore, the observation of our actual uses of expressions in the huge variety of contexts and speech-acts we do and can use them in would be irrelevant to determining the meaning of expressions. On the contrary, for the Ordinary Language Philosopher, linguistic meaning may only be determined by the observation of the various uses of expressions in their actual ordinary uses, and it is not independent of these. Thus, Wittgenstein claimed that:

For a large class of cases – though not for all – in which we employ the word “meaning” it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language. (Section 43)

Does this mean that only sometimes ‘meaning is use’? The remark has been interpreted this way (for example Lycan 1999, pp. 99, fn 2). But it need not be. We need to notice that in the remark, Wittgenstein refers to ‘cases where we employ the word “meaning,”’ and not ‘cases of meaning’. The difference, it might be said, is that sometimes when we use the term ‘meaning’ we are not talking about linguistic meaning. That is, we may talk about for example “The meaning of her phone call,” in which case we are not going to be assisted by looking to the use of the word ‘phone call’ in the language. On the other hand, when we use the word ‘meaning’ as in “The meaning of ‘broiling’ is (such and such),” then looking to the use of the word ‘broiling’ in the language will help. Thus, an interpretation is possible in which the remark does not mean that only sometimes ‘meaning is use’. Rather, we can interpret it as claiming that linguistic meaning is to be found in language use.

At the most fundamental base of a use-theory, language is not representational - although it is sometimes (perhaps even almost always) used to represent. On the view, the ‘meaning’ of a term (or expression) is exhausted by its use: there is nothing further, nothing ‘over and above’, the use of an expression for its meaning to be.

A good many objections have been raised to this theory, which we cannot here examine in full. However, most appear to object to it because it apparently rules out the possibility of a systematic theory of meaning. If meaning-is-use, then the ideal language approach is out of the question, and determining linguistic meaning becomes an ad-hoc process. This thought has displeased many, as they have understood it to entail something of an end to the possibility of a philosophy of language per se. Dummett (1973), for example, has complained that:

…[although] the ‘philosophy of ordinary language’ was indeed a species of linguistic philosophy, [it was] one which was contrary to the spirit of Frege in two fundamental ways, namely in its dogmatic denial of the possibility of system, and in its treatment of natural language as immune from criticism. (pp. 683)

Soames (2003) goes on to echo the same complaint:

Rather than constructing general theories of meaning, philosophers were supposed to attend to subtle aspects of language use, and to show how misuse of certain words leads to philosophical perplexity and confusion. [Such a view] proved to be unstable… What is needed is some sort of systematic theory of what meaning is, and how it interacts with these other factors governing the use of language. (pp. xiv)

It was ultimately the re-introduction of the possibility of a systematic theory of meaning by Grice, later at Oxford (see section 5, below), that finally spelled the end for Ordinary Language philosophy.

4. Oxford

By the 1940s, the views of the later Wittgenstein, and the Wittgensteinians, had penetrated Oxford. There, philosophers took up the ideas of Wittgenstein, but they were much more critical and much more interested in developing their own views. The move now was to apply the principles to be found in Wittgenstein, and to show how they could actually contribute significantly to philosophy – rather than merely make philosophical problems ‘disappear’. ‘Oxford’ philosophy was still ‘linguistic’, but much less dogmatically so, much more flexible in its approach, much less interested in metaphilosophical justification for their views and rather more interested in applying their views to real, current, philosophical problems. The Oxford philosophers no longer treated all philosophical problems as mere ‘pseudo-problems’, nor even all of them as ‘linguistic’. But nevertheless they retained the view that philosophical uses of language can be a source of philosophical confusions and that the observation and study of ordinary language would help to resolve them. What was new, regarding Ordinary Language philosophy, was the rejection of Wittgenstein’s idea that there could be no proper ‘philosophical’ knowledge.

Austin famously remarked:

Certainly ordinary language has no claim to be the last word, if there is such a thing. It embodies, indeed, something better than the metaphysics of the Stone Age, namely… the inherited experience and acumen of many generations of men. But then, that acumen has been concentrated primarily upon the practical business of life. If a distinction works well for practical purposes in ordinary life (no mean feat, for even ordinary life is full of hard cases), it will not mark nothing: yet this is likely enough to be not the best way of arranging things if our interests are more extensive or intellectual than the ordinary… Certainly, then, ordinary language is not the last word: in principle it can everywhere be supplemented and improved upon and superseded. Only remember, it is the first word. (And forget, for once and for a while, that other curious question “Is it true?” May we?) (1956, pp. 185 and fn 2 in parentheses)

a. Ryle

Ryle emerged at Oxford as one of the most important figures in early 20th century analytic philosophy. Ryle, indeed, became a champion of ‘ordinary language’, writing, in his early career, a number of papers dealing with such issues as what counts as ‘ordinary’ language, what are the nature of ‘meanings’, and how the appeal to ordinary ways of describing things can help resolve philosophical problems (including his 1931, 1953, 1957, 1961). In particular, Ryle became famous for his treatment of mental phenomena in his Concept of Mind (1949). The book contains, overall, a ‘behaviorist’ analysis of mental phenomena that draws heavily on Wittgensteinian anti-Cartesianism – or anti-dualism (of ‘mind’ and ‘body’). On this view, the mind is not a kind of ‘gaseous’ but non-spatial, non-physical medium of thoughts, nor is it a kind of ‘theatre’ via which we observe our own experiences and sensations. Our mental life is not, according to Ryle, a private domain to which each individual has exclusive access. Our psychological language expresses our thoughts; it does not describe what is going on in the mind in the same way that physical language describes what is going on in the body, according to Ryle in this period.

The ‘Cartesian Myth’ of the mind – what Ryle calls the “Dogma of the Ghost in the Machine” (1949, pp. 15) – is perpetuated, according to Ryle, because philosophers commit what he calls a ‘category mistake’ in applying the language of the physical world to the psychological world (for example, talking about ‘events’ and ‘causes’ in the mind as we would talk of such things in the body). Contrary to this ‘myth’, according to Ryle, our access to our own thoughts and feelings are not, like our access to those of others, something we observe about ourselves (by looking ‘inward’ as opposed to ‘outward’). We do not observe our thoughts; we think them. What we call ‘beliefs’, ‘thoughts’, ‘knowledge’, ‘feelings’, and so forth are not special kinds of ‘occult’ objects ‘inside’ the mind. As regards ‘other minds’, psychological phenomena are available publicly in certain behaviors (which are not mere ‘signs’ of what is going on internally in others, but partially what constitutes what it is to attribute such things, for example, as ‘believing X’, ‘thinking about Y’, and so forth). Ryle arrives at these views through the analysis of the ordinary uses of psychological expressions, remarking:

I am not, for example, denying that there occur mental processes. Doing long division is a mental process and so is making a joke. But I am saying that the phrase ‘there occur mental processes’ does not mean the same thing as ‘there occur physical processes’, and, therefore it makes no sense to conjoin or disjoin the two. (1949, pp. 22)

The view Ryle promotes is that the expressions we use in attributing psychological states and the expressions we use in attributing physical states have quite distinct uses, and that when we see this aright, we see that it does not make sense to conflate them in claims such as ‘an intention in her mind caused her arm to rise’ (the sort of things one might expect on the ‘Ghost in the Machine’ theory). In everyday life, we know perfectly well, for example, what the criteria are in virtue of which we count a person as, for example, thinking, calculating, having raised an arm intentionally, and so forth. Puzzlement only arises, according to Ryle, when philosophers try to account for mental phenomena according to the ‘logic’ of the category of physical phenomena, for example, talking about the mystery of ‘mental causation’.

By highlighting the ordinary use of mental-phenomena expressions, and the ways in which we ordinarily ascribe them to people (for example, “She is thinking about home,” “I wish I had a cup-cake,” “He is adding up the bill,” and so on), Ryle shows that the philosophical problem of how mental phenomena can interact with physical phenomena is poorly formulated. The manner in which psychological terms are used in such philosophical problems, theories, and so forth, are not the same ways the terms are used in ordinary discourse. Using the terms in this way leads philosophers to conclude either that some form of dualism of mind and body or some form of physicalism is true (see Mental Causation for more on the traditional theories of mind). But observing our ordinary uses of psychological terms shows, Ryle argues, that as we mean them to describe ourselves and one another (and sometimes even when we apply psychological terms to non-people), mental phenomena need not be understood as ‘internal’ events that we observe, nor as reducible, in some sense, to mere brain-states.

b. Austin

Austin, at Oxford, first took up the issue of the so-called ‘sense-data’ theory, originally formulated by Russell (as we saw above). His Sense and Sensibilia (1962) (a pun on Jane Austen’s Sense and Sensibility) is a classic of ordinary language analysis. It contrasts the ordinary uses of the words ‘looks’, ‘seems’, ‘appears’ ‘perceives’, and so forth to the ways they are used in support of the sense-data theory. The argument for sense-data is, partially, based on the view that we are unable to distinguish between veridical experience and illusion. Therefore, the reasoning goes, all we can be sure of is what is common to both experiences, which is the ‘seeming to be such and such’ or sense-data. So, on the view, because it is possible that any experience may be an illusion, the only thing that is certain is the sense-data before the mind. Of this theory Austin says:

My general opinion about this doctrine is that it is a typically scholastic view, attributable…to an obsession with a few particular words, the uses of which are over-simplified, not really understood or carefully studied or correctly described…The fact is, as I shall try to make clear, that our ordinary words are much subtler in their uses, and mark many more distinctions, than philosophers have realized; and that the facts of perception…are much more diverse and complicated than has been allowed for. (1962, pp. 3)

Austin points out, amongst other things, that, as a matter of fact we do know the difference between a veridical and an illusory experience, and we speak of such experiences differently – the distinction between ‘veridical’ and ‘illusory’ has an established, and ordinary, use in language. For example, a stick placed in a glass of water appears to be bent, but we have criteria for describing the difference between this bent stick and a stick which is bent outside the glass. We say, “the stick looks bent” in the water, but we say, “the stick is bent” of the other. The availability of ways in language to mark the distinction between illusions and veridical experiences demonstrates, according to Austin, that the sense-data argument is invalid - because those terms, which have ordinary uses in language, are misused in the sense-data theory. For example, if the sense-data theory is true, then we are marking nothing in our experience when we distinguish between ‘veridical’ and ‘illusory’ experiences – those expressions have no real meaning (we are failing to express anything in their utterance). The same would follow, if the sense-data theory were correct, that our ordinary uses of cognate terms such as ‘appearing’, ‘looking’, ‘seeming’, and so forth, and also ‘finding out that X was not as it appeared to be’ have no application – since there would be no ‘real’ distinction, for us, between how things appear and how they really are. This conclusion, from which it follows that we should withdraw the terms ‘veridical’ and ‘illusory’ from use in language, is absurd – the distinction is marked in language and therefore exists (for example, between the way things ‘look’ and the way things ‘are’ – though we are not always infallible in our judgments). The question whether or not the distinction corresponds with a metaphysical reality (“But do sticks really exist,” and so forth), is a question about some other distinction – not the distinction we draw, in ordinary use, between ‘appears to be’ and ‘is’. And so, by attending to the ordinary uses of terms such as ‘veridical’ and ‘illusory’ and their cognates, Austin shows that the philosophical use of them in formulating the sense-data thesis is based on a misconstrual of their ordinary meanings.

Austin became a master of the observation of the uses of language. He noted nuanced differences in the ways words very close in meaning are used that many others missed. He showed that, even in its most ordinary uses, language is indeed a much finer, sensitive and precise instrument than had previously been acknowledged. Such observations belie the view that ordinary language is somehow deficient for the purposes of describing reality. Austin demonstrated, through his explorations, the flexibility of language, how subtle variations in meaning were possible, how delicate, sometimes, is the choice of a word for saying what one wants or needs to say. He called his method ‘linguistic phenomenology’ (1956, pp. 182). What his demonstrations of the fineness of grain of meaning, in very concrete and particular examples, showed was that philosophical uses of language take expressions out of their ordinary working environment, that is, everyday communicative discourse. Wittgenstein described this as ‘language going on holiday’ (1953, section 38). Such philosophical uses, Austin showed, treat expressions as rigid, one-dimensional, rather blunt instruments, with far less descriptive power than ordinary language: thus contradicting the view that the philosophical uses of language are more ‘accurate’ and ‘precise’.

Austin is also well known for his original work on what is now known as ‘speech-act’ theory, in his How to Do Things with Words (based on his William James Lectures delivered at Harvard in 1955, published as a monograph in 1962). Key to Austin’s achievement here was his development of the idea that the utterances of sentences in the use of language are not all of the same kind: not all utterances represent some aspect of the world (for example, not all utterances are assertions). Some, perhaps many, utterances involve executing actions. Austin’s example is the making of a promise. To utter “I promise to pay you back” is, on Austin’s analysis, to perform an act, that is to say, the very act of promising is carried out in uttering the sentence, rather than the sentence describing a state of affairs (that is, oneself in the state of promising). Austin developed an extensive taxonomy of the uses of language, establishing firmly the notion that language goes beyond simple representation, and has social and pragmatic dimensions that must be taken into account by any adequate theory of linguistic meaning.

c. Strawson

Strawson, who was a pupil of Grice, developed in his mature work a Kantian thesis aiming to uncover the most fundamental categories of thought. This project, which Strawson called a ‘descriptive metaphysics’, was to investigate what he called our ‘fundamental conceptual structure’. Strawson understood the philosophical project to require more than the appeal to ordinary language. He said,

Up to a point, the reliance upon a close examination of the actual use of words is the best, and indeed the only sure, way in philosophy. But the discriminations we can make, and the connexions we can establish, in this way are not general enough and not far-reaching enough to meet the full metaphysical demand for understanding. For when we ask how we use this or that expression, our answers, however revealing at a certain level, are apt to assume, and not to expose, those general elements of the structure that the metaphysician wants revealed. (1959, pp. 9-10)

The investigation of our conceptual structure had to involve more than the observation of our ordinary uses of language (which only assume that structure), but, nevertheless, the project, via transcendental argument, remained one of description of our ordinary ways of experiencing the world. Strawson’s view, contrary to the Wittgensteinian doctrine that philosophy is no more than descriptive of what is open to view to anyone, was that descriptive metaphysics involved the acquisition of genuinely new philosophical knowledge, and not merely the resolution of philosophical confusion. In this project, however, Strawson did not stray altogether too far from the Ordinary Language philosophical commitments (compare Strawson 1962, pp. 320), and his ‘linguistic’ philosophical credentials remained sound. Nevertheless, he believed that there was a deeper metaphysical reality concerning our conceptual structure that needed uncovering via a ‘descriptive metaphysics’. Strawson influenced the shift in philosophical interest from language to concepts – but the methodology and metaphilosophical rationale remained the same: the view that there is no route to a ‘metaphysical reality’ that is independent of our experience of it. Our experience of reality is, on this view, mediated by our particular conceptual structure, and a careful description of our ordinary experience – through the appeal to ordinary language – will help us to understand the nature of the conceptual structure.

Earlier in his career, Strawson criticized Russell’s revered Theory of Descriptions in his 1950 paper ‘On Referring’. Here Strawson objected that Russell failed to take into account the fact that not all uses of sentences make either true or false statements. If we distinguish ‘sentences’ and ‘statements’, indeed, we shall see that sentences are not always used to make statements. Sentences have many and varied uses, but are not, in and of themselves, true or false; what they are used to say may well be true or false (but there are also other uses than statement-making). Strawson argued that Russell had conflated meaning with, roughly, a truth-condition (or a reference). He said, on the contrary, that,

… the question whether a sentence or expression is significant or not has nothing whatever to do with the question of whether the sentence, uttered on a particular occasion, is, on that occasion, being used to make a true-or-false assertion or not, or of whether the expression is, on that occasion, being used to refer to, or mention, anything at all… the fact that [a sentence] is significant is the same as the fact that it can be correctly used to talk about something and that, in so using it, someone will be making a true or false assertion. (1950, pp. 172-173)

This position presaged a much more contemporary debate between those who hold that the meaning of a sentence remains invariant over contexts of use, and those who hold the contrary (see below, section 6).

In 1956, Strawson and his teacher, H. P. Grice, together published a paper that attacked Quine’s repudiation of the so-called ‘analytic-synthetic’ distinction. The repudiation is based on the idea that because the distinction has a use in the language, certainly in philosophy - but it is a distinction that is also marked outside of philosophy - then it has an inviolable place in language. They say, “…‘analytic’ and ‘synthetic’ have a more or less established [philosophical and ordinary] use; and this seems to suggest that it is absurd, even senseless, to say there is no such distinction” (1956, pp. 43). This is a classic example of the so-called ‘paradigm-case argument’. When Quine denies the analytic-synthetic distinction, it is to suggest that the distinction has no application. But that suggestion is demonstrably false, since we do apply the distinction (or more prosaic cognates of ‘analytic’, for example, ‘synonymous’ or ‘means the same as’, and so forth). Whether or not there is a metaphysical reality to which this distinction corresponds is quite superfluous to the reality that it is a distinction that has a use in the language, and its use alone justifies its being a perfectly meaningful one to make (1956, pp. 143).

5. The Demise of Ordinary Language Philosophy: Grice

It was ultimately Grice who came to introduce, at Oxford, some of the first ideas that marked the significant fall from grace of Ordinary Language philosophy. Other factors combined to contribute to the general demise of Ordinary Language philosophy, in particular the rise in popularity of formal semantics, but also a renewed pursuit of ‘naturalism’ in philosophy, aimed at drawing the discipline nearer, once again, to the sciences. In this climate, aspects of the ‘ideal language’ view emerged as dominant, mostly manifesting in a commitment to a truth-conditional view of meaning in the philosophy of language. Grice had a special place in this story because his work, as well as providing the argument which threw Ordinary Language philosophical principles into doubt, contributed to the development of a field of study that ultimately became the wellspring of those carrying on the legacy of the Ordinary Language philosophers in the 21st century; namely speech-act theory.

Grice’s version of ‘speech-act theory’ (see also section 4c of Philosophy of Language) included an ‘intention-based’ theory of communication. The basic principle of speech-act theory (as Austin, and Grice following him, developed it) is that language is not merely a system of symbols that represent things – the process of communication is a result of interaction between agents, and the pragmatic aspects of communication must be factored into any account of linguistic meaning. As Austin emphasized, language use is, in part, the performance of actions, as well as the representation of the world. In particular, for Grice, part of what matters, for a theory of language, is what the agent intends to communicate. One of the most important concepts introduced by Grice is that of conversational implicature (see the chapter entitled ‘Logic and Conversation’ in his 1989). The notion of conversational implicature suggests that part of what is communicated, in conversation, is communicated pragmatically rather than semantically. For example, take the following sentences:

(a) He took out his key and opened the door.

(b) Jones got married and had children.

(c) (looking in the refrigerator) “There is no beer.”

We might understand (a) to imply that he opened the door with the key he took out. But, the words alone do not strictly say this. Similarly, in (b), we might understand that Jones got married and had children in that order, and such that the two events are connected in the relevant way, and in (c), we generally understand the claim to be about the lack of beer in the fridge, not in the universe. In all of these examples, according to Grice, information is communicated, not by the semantics of the sentences alone, but by the pragmatic process he calls conversational implicature. (For more detail on Grice’s taxonomy of pragmatic processes, and also his views about the ‘maxims of conversation’, see Grice 1989.)

Pragmatic aspects of communication, according to Grice, must be distinguished from the strictly semantic aspects, and thus, according to him, meaning must not be confused with use. But this, on his view, is precisely what the Ordinary Language philosophers do, insofar as their ‘appeal to ordinary language’ is based on the view that meaning is determined by use (see the chapter entitled ‘Prolegomena’ in his 1989). Indeed, Grice here launches a detailed attack on many of the ‘ordinary language’ analyses put forward by, amongst others, Wittgenstein, Ryle, Austin, Malcolm and Strawson. In each case, Grice argues that where the Ordinary Language philosopher appeals to the use of the expression, especially in order to throw doubt on some other philosophical theory, what occurs is the failure to distinguish meaning (that is, ‘semantic content’ or ‘truth-conditions’) and use (that is, pragmatic aspects of communication such as implicature). Therefore, the argument that philosophical non-ordinary uses of expressions are a problem for metaphysical theses is itself at fault. (It should be noted that, this view notwithstanding, Grice remained more or less in agreement with the general view that ‘ordinary language is correct’ - compare Grice, the chapter entitled ‘Postwar Oxford Philosophy’ in his 1989.)

The general criticism, from Grice, is that the arguments of the Ordinary Language philosophers cannot be run on the basic semantics of expressions – they can apply only to the uses particular expressions are put to in specific examples. This complaint touches on the actual claims Ordinary Language philosophers have made about the use and meaning of certain expressions – in particular, claims as to when it would or would not ‘make sense’ to say “X,” or to use “X” in a certain way. To recall an example we are now familiar with - the term ‘know’ - Grice argued that, for example, when Malcolm contended that the skeptical use of ‘know’ is a misuse of that term, that this claim shows nothing relevant about the meaning of the term or the expressions in which it features. The oddness, for example, of applying the term ‘know’ in certain ways, for example, in “I feel pain, but I do not know for sure” is generated by the pragmatic features of that particular use, and is independent of the strictly semantic features.

Grice’s argument about distinguishing meaning and use appeals to the notion of the existence of an independent semantics of a language – that is, the idea that the expressions of a language have meanings which are both independent of, and invariant over, the wide variety of uses those expressions might figure in. Thus, on this view, a ‘philosophical’ and an ‘ordinary’ use of some expression do not differ in meaning – contrary to the claim of Ordinary Language philosophy. Thus, for example, an expression has an invariant semantic content even though, in its use, it may have a variety of conversational implicatures. However, the latter, on this view, are not part of the ‘meaning’ proper. Thus, observations about variations in the use of some expression will tell us nothing about its meaning.

The upshot of this argument is that the so-called ‘paradoxical’ statements attributed to classical metaphysical philosophy by the Ordinary Language philosophers may not be so paradoxical after all. Moreover, and perhaps more significantly, what this view made possible once again was the pursuit of a systematic theory of language. Use-theories could not, on the received view, be ‘systematic’ in the way required (broadly: computational). Indeed, Grice remarked, “My primary aim is… to determine how any such distinction between meaning and use is to be drawn, and where lie the limits of its philosophical utility. Any serious attempt to achieve this aim will, I think, involve a search for a systematic theory of language…” (1989, pp. 4).

The view that there ought to be possible a ‘systematic’ theory of language gained considerable ground on the passport given it by Grice. That is, if the distinction between meaning and use is correct, then a good deal of the linguistic phenomena pointed out by the Ordinary Language philosophers, and which was supposed to have ramifications for the meaning, and therefore correct use, of expressions can now be fully accounted for by a variety of ‘pragmatic’ aspects of communication. Therefore, the core, classical semantic theory for a language could continue to be pursued more or less independently of issues connected with language use; and pragmatics can generally be called upon to account for any linguistic phenomena that semantics cannot.

Of course, this argument depends on the ability of the Gricean to sufficiently identify something like the ‘literal meaning’ of a sentence (that which is to be designated the ‘semantic’ rather than the ‘pragmatic’ content of a speech-act); and in which it may occur independently of any particular conversational implicatures it is used to convey, on an occasion of use. Isolating such a literal, invariant meaning has, however, proven difficult. For example, Charles Travis (1996; 1999) has pointed out, a variety of ways that a sentence may be used quite literally, non-metaphorically, seriously and sincerely – and yet still express two distinct propositions, that is, have two distinct truth-conditions and thus fail to have an invariant semantic content. A classic ‘Travis-style’ example is a sentence such as “Pass me the red book.” Such a sentence could be used, quite literally, non-metaphorically, and so forth, to request someone to pass the book that has a red cover, and it can be used to request someone to pass the book which has only a red spine. What counts as ‘red’ in these cases is different: that is, a thing can be completely, or only partially, red to count in certain contexts. This difference in what is expressed cannot be classified as conversational implicature, so both propositions are properly semantically expressed. But Grice’s distinction is supposed to show how to isolate one semantic content, or proposition, or truth-condition per sentence. Hence the Gricean has a problem in accounting for a semantic-pragmatic distinction in the content of speech-acts – a distinction that is required for the argument against Ordinary Language philosophy to work

6. Contemporary Views

The remainder of the 20th century saw the rise of the general ‘ideal language’ approach, including a commitment to versions of truth-conditional theories of meaning, to a position of dominance. However, in recent years (the early 21st century), there has been something of a renaissance of the ideas originating in Ordinary Language philosophy. François Recanati (2004) remarked that,

Despite [that] early antagonism… semantics (the formal study of meaning and truth-conditions) and pragmatics (the study of language in use) are now conceived of as complementary disciplines, shedding light on different aspects of language… Instructed by Grice they systematically draw a distinction between what a given expression means, and what its use means or conveys in a particular context (or even in general). (pp. 2-3)

However, this appearance of co-operative reconciliation – that at least some kind of semantics-pragmatics interaction will provide a complete theory of language – is to a certain extent merely a façade of orthodoxy, which obscures somewhat more radical underlying views. A spectrum of positions now runs between radical extremes of how much of what we want to call ‘meaning’ is determined by semantics, and how much by pragmatics. The argument can roughly be described as a difference as to the degree of independence (from pragmatics) that we can ascribe to linguistic meaning. Some are of the view that at least a core of semantic content remains untouched by pragmatic effects. Others hold that all semantic content is ‘pragmatically saturated’. These positions carry on the legacies of Ideal and Ordinary Language philosophies respectively – now known as variations on ‘Literalism’ and ‘Contextualism’. (See Recanati 2004 for a clarifying description of the various views that now compose the debate.) The former position has also pitched itself as a semantic ‘minimalism’ or ‘invariantism’ (compare Cappelen and Lepore 2005; Borg 2004). Contextualism, the view that has its origins in Ordinary Language philosophy, has support from, for example, Recanati (2004) and Travis (who argues for the ‘occasion-sensitivity’ of meaning, see his 1996). Supporters of the notion of the context (or use)-sensitivity of meaning object to Grice’s original argument: that we really can cleave a distinctly semantic content from all other aspects of language use. Contextualists argue that it is difficult, perhaps impossible, to isolate a purely semantic core, untouched by pragmatic influences, for example a ‘literal’ meaning (compare Searle 1979; Recanati 2004).

Nevertheless, there have been highly successful efforts at devising theories which treat of many of the phenomena assumed to be pragmatic, but which nevertheless have been shown to have inextricably semantic effects. Examples of such phenomena include, for example, indexicality, quantifier domain restriction, seemingly relative or ‘scalar’ terms such as ‘tall’, ‘rich’ and so on. The theories in question aim at showing that such phenomena are after all perfectly formalizable aspects of a classical semantic account, and not merely pragmatic effects on meaning (a classic example of such work is to be found in Stanley and Gendler Szabo 2000 and King and Stanley 2005). Along these lines, the philosophy of language is well on its way (again) toward being based on a ‘systematic’ theory of meaning. Nevertheless, the ‘Homeric struggle’ Strawson described (2004, pp. 132) between two fundamentally opposing views about linguistic meaning continues.


7. References and Further Reading

a. Analysis and Formal Logic

  • Beaney, Michael. (Ed.). 1997. The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Dummett, Michael. 1981 [1973]. Frege: Philosophy of Language. London: Duckworth.
  • Dummett, Michael. 1997 [1993]. The Seas of Language. London: Oxford University Press.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1997 [1879]. “Begriffsschrift: Selections (Preface and Part I).” In M. Beaney, ed., The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 47-78.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1997 [1918]. “Thought.” In M. Beaney, ed., The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 325-345.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1997 [1891]. “Function and Concept.” In M. Beaney, ed., The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 130-148.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1997 [1892]. “On Sinn and Bedeutung.” In M. Beaney, ed., The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 151-171.
  • Ramsey, Frank P. 1959 [1931]. “Philosophy.” In A. J. Ayer, ed., Logical Positivism. New York: The Free Press, 321-326.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1949 [1905]. “On Denoting.” In H. Feigl and W. Sellars, eds., Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts, 103-119.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1910. “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 11, 108-128.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1914. Our Knowledge of the External World. La Salle: Open Court.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1995 [1921]. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, trans., D. F. Pears. London: Routledge.

b. Logical Atomism

  • Ayer, Alfred Jules. 1940. The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge. London: Macmillan.
  • Pears, David. 1972. Russell’s Logical Atomism. Illinois: Fontana Press.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1918-1919. “The Philosophy of Logical Atomism.” The Monist 28, 495-527; 29, 32-63, 190-222, 345-380.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1959 [1924]. “Logical Atomism.” In A. J. Ayer, ed., Logical Positivism. New York: The Free Press, 31-50.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1927. The Analysis of Matter. London: George Allen and Unwin.

c. Logical Positivism and Ideal Language

  • Ayer, Alfred Jules. (Ed.). 1959. Logical Positivism. New York: The Free Press.
    • A collection of seminal papers in Logical Positivism.
  • Bergmann, Gustav. 1992 [1953]. “Logical Positivism, Language, and the Reconstruction of Metaphysics.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 63-71.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1949. Truth and confirmation. In H. Feigl and W. Sellars, eds., Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts, 119-127.
    • Discusses the Ideal/Ordinary Language philosophical differences in detail.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1992 [1934]. “On the Character of Philosophic Problems.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 54-62.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1937. The Logical Syntax of Language, trans., A. Smeaton. London: Routledge.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1992 [1950]. “Empiricism, Semantics and Ontology.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 72-84.
  • Coffa, J. Alberto. 1991. The Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Feigl, Herbert and Sellars, Wilfrid. (Eds.). 1949. Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts.
    • A collection of early papers in Logical Positivism.
  • Feigl, Herbert. 1949 [1943]. “Logical Empiricism.” In H. Feigl and W. Sellars, eds., Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts, 3-26.
  • Rorty, Richard. 1992 [1967]. “Introduction.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1-39.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur. 1997 [1963]. The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap. LaSalle: Open Court.
  • Schlick, Moritz. 1992 [1932]. “The Future of Philosophy.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 43-53.

d. Early Ordinary Language Philosophy

  • Ambrose, Alice. 1950. “The Problem of Linguistic Inadequacy.” In M. Black, ed., Philosophical Analysis. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 15-37.
  • Ambrose, Alice and Lazerowitz, Morris. 1985. Necessity and Language. London: Croom Helm.
  • Black, Max. (Ed.). 1950. Philosophical Analysis. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall.
  • Black, Max. (Ed.). 1954. Problems of Analysis. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Chappell, Vere Claiborne. (Ed.). 1964. Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall.
    • Basic collection of essential Ordinary Language philosophical classics.
  • Caton, Charles Edwin. (Ed.). 1963. Philosophy and Ordinary Language. Urbana: University of Illinois Press.
  • Farrell, Brian. (1946a). An appraisal of therapeutic positivism I. Mind 55, 25-48.
  • Farrell, Brian. (1946b). An appraisal of therapeutic positivism II. Mind 55, 133-150.
  • Flew, Antony. (Ed.). 1951. Logic and Language. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Flew, Antony. (Ed.). 1953. Logic and Language, 2nd Series. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Flew, Antony. (Ed.). 1956. Essays in Conceptual Analysis. London: Macmillan.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1964 [1942a]. “Moore and Ordinary Language.” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 5-23.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1942b. “Certainty and Empirical Statements.” Mind 52, 18-36.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1940. “Are Necessary Propositions Really Verbal?” Mind 69, 189-203.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1949. “Defending Common Sense.” Philosophical Review 58, 201- 220.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1951. “Philosophy for Philosophers.” Philosophical Review 60, 329-340.
  • Rorty, Richard. (Ed.). 1992 [1967]. The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
    • A unique and seminal collection of essays on both the Ordinary Language and the Ideal Language views. Rorty’s introductions are well worth reading for their insightful comments on the issues involved. Has an enormous and comprehensive cross-referenced bibliography on the literature.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1992 [1931]. “Systematically Misleading Expressions.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 85-100.
  • Wisdom, John. 1936. “Philosophical Perplexity.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 37, 71-88.
  • Wisdom, John. 1953. Philosophy and Psycho-Analysis. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1965 [1958]. The Blue and Brown Books. New York: Harper and Row.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1994 [1953]. Philosophical Investigations, trans., G. E. M. Anscombe. Oxford: Blackwell.

e. The Paradigm Case Argument

  • Flew, Antony. 1957. “Farewell to the Paradigm-Case Argument: A Comment.” Analysis 18, 34-40.
  • Hanfling, Oswald. 1990. “What is Wrong with the paradigm-Case Argument?” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 99, 21-37.
  • Richman, Robert J. 1961. “On the Argument of the Paradigm Case.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 39, 75-81.
  • Watkins, John William Nevill. 1957. “Farewell to the Paradigm-Case Argument.” Analysis 18, 25-33.

f. Oxford Ordinary Language Philosophy

  • Austin, John Langshaw. 1962. How to Do Things With Words. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Austin, John Langshaw. 1964 [1956]. “A Plea for Excuses.” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 41-63.
  • Austin, John Langshaw. 1962. Sense and Sensibilia, ed., G. J. Warnock. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John Langshaw. 1979. Philosophical Papers, eds., J. O. Urmson and G. J. Warnock. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Cavell, Stanley. 1964 [1958]. “Must We Mean What We Say?” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 75-112.
  • Henson, Richard. 1965. “What We Say.” American Philosophical Quarterly 2, 52-62.
  • McDowell, John. 1994. Mind and World. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1949. The Concept of Mind. London: Hutchinson.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1964 [1953]. “Ordinary Language.” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 24-40.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1963 [1957]. “The Theory of Meaning.” In C. Caton, ed., Philosophy and Ordinary Language. Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 128-153.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1961. “Use, Usage and Meaning.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volumes 35, 223-230.
  • Searle, John. (Ed.). 1971. The Philosophy of Language. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Collection of essays on the Oxford Ordinary Language approach.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick and Grice, Herbert Paul. 1956. “In Defence of a Dogma.” Philosophical Review 65, 141-158.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick. 1950. “On Referring.” Mind 59, 320-344.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick. 1959. Individuals: An Essay in Descriptive Metaphysics. London: Methuen.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick. 1952. Introduction to Logical Theory. London: Methuen.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick. 2004 [1971]. Logico-Linguistic Papers. Aldershot: Ashgate.

g. Criticism of Ordinary Language Philosophy

  • Campbell, Chares Arthur. 1944. “Commonsense Propositions and Philosophical Paradoxes.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 45, 1-25.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. 1992 [1951]. “Philosophers and Ordinary Language.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 175-182.
  • Devitt, Michael and Sterelny, Kim. 1999. Language and Reality: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Language, 2nd ed. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Fodor, Jerry and Katz, Jerrold J. 1971 [1963]. “The Availability of What We Say.” In C. Lyas, ed., Philosophy and Linguistics. London: Macmillan, 190-203.
  • Grice Herbert Paul. 1989. Studies in the Way of Words. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Gellner, Ernest André. 1959. Words and Things: A Critical Account of Linguistic Philosophy and a Study in Ideology. London: Gollancz.
    • A hyperbolic criticism of linguistic philosophies.
  • Lewis, Hywel David. (Ed.). 1963. Clarity is not Enough: Essays in Criticism of Linguistic Philosophy. London: George Allen and Unwin.
    • Early collection of critical essays.
  • Mates, Benson. 1964 [1958]. “On the Verification of Ordinary Language.” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 64-74.
  • Rollins, Calvin Dwight. 1951. “Ordinary Language and Procrustean Beds.” Mind 60, 223-232.
  • Tennessen, Herman. 1965. “Ordinary Language in Memoriam.” Inquiry 8, 225-248.
  • Weitz, Morris. 1947. “Philosophy and the Abuse of Language.” Journal of Philosophy 44, 533-546.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2007. The Philosophy of Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Woozley, Anthony Douglas. 1953. “Ordinary Language and Common Sense.” Mind 62, 301-312.

h. Contemporary views

  • Borg, Emma. 2004. Minimal Semantics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Pro-truth-conditional, invariant semantics for linguistic meaning.
  • Cappelen, Herman and Lepore, Ernie. 2005. Insensitive Semantics: A Defense of Semantic Minimalism and Speech Act Pluralism. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Pro-truth-conditional, invariant semantics for linguistic meaning.
  • Gendler Szabó, Zoltán. (Ed.). 2005. Semantics versus Pragmatics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Excellent collection of essays targeting the Minimalist/Contextualist debate about linguistic meaning.
  • Hale, Bob and Wright, Crispin. (Eds.). 1997. A Companion to the Philosophy of Language. London: Routledge.
    • Good anthology of relevant essays.
  • King, Jeffrey and Stanley, Jason. 2005. “Semantics, Pragmatics and the Role of Semantic Content.” In Z. Gendler Szabó, ed., Semantics versus Pragmatics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 111-164.
  • Lycan, William. 1999. The Philosophy of Language: A Contemporary Introduction. New York: Routledge.
  • Recanati, Francois. 2004. Literal Meaning. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Thorough discussion of the Minimalist/Contextualist debate, supportive of a moderately Contextualist view about linguistic meaning.
  • Searle, John. 1969. Speech Acts. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Searle, John. 1979 [1978]. “Literal Meaning.” In J. Searle, ed., Expression and Meaning. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 117-136.
  • Stanley, Jason and Gendler Szabó, Zoltán. 2000. “On Quantifier Domain Restriction.” Mind and Language 15, 219-261.
  • Travis, Charles. 1996. “Meaning’s Role in Truth.” Mind 100, 451-466.
    • A ‘radical’ Contextualist, and anti-Minimalist about linguistic meaning.
  • Travis, Charles. 1999. “Pragmatics.” In B. Hale and C. Wright, eds., A Companion to the Philosophy of Language. London: Routledge, 87-107.

i. Historical and Other Commentaries

  • Hacker, Peter Michael Stephan. 1996. Wittgenstein’s Place in Twentieth-Century Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Thorough historical account of early analytic philosophy, including detailed biographical information on philosophers – for example, who worked with whom, and who was whose pupils/teachers. Reads easily, as a first-hand account.
  • Hanfling, Oswald. (2000). Philosophy and Ordinary Language: The Bent and Genius of Our Tongue. London: Routledge.
    • One of the only modern defenses of Ordinary Language philosophy.
  • Klibansky, Raymond. (Ed.). 1958. Philosophy in the Mid-Century, Volume 2. Florence: La Nuova Italia.
  • Lyas, Colin. (Ed.). 1971. Philosophy and Linguistics. London: Macmillan.
    • Addresses the debate regarding ‘what we say’, and some Oxford Ordinary Language philosophical disputes.
  • Passmore, John Arthur. 1957. “Wittgenstein and Ordinary Language Philosophy.” In J. A. Passmore, A Hundred Years of Philosophy. London: Duckworth.
    • An early account of Ordinary Language philosophy, at a time when it was still in vogue.
  • Quinton, Anthony. 1958. “Linguistic Analysis.” In R. Klibansky, ed., Philosophy in the Mid-Century, Volume 2. Florence: La Nuova Italia.
    • Excellent bibliography.
  • Soames, Scott. 2003. Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century, Volume 2: The Age of Meaning. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Urmson, James Opie. 1956. Philosophical Analysis: Its Development Between the Two World Wars. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Warnock, Geoffrey James. (Ed.). 1960. The Revolution in Philosophy. London: Macmillan.


Author Information

Sally Parker-Ryan
U. S. A.