Moral Relativism

Moral relativism is the view that moral judgments are true or false only relative to some particular standpoint (for instance, that of a culture or a historical period) and that no standpoint is uniquely privileged over all others.  It has often been associated with other claims about morality: notably, the thesis that different cultures often exhibit radically different moral values; the denial that there are universal moral values shared by every human society; and the insistence that we should refrain from passing moral judgments on beliefs and practices characteristic of cultures other than our own.

Relativistic views of morality first found expression in 5th century B.C.E. Greece, but they remained largely dormant until the 19th and 20th centuries.  During this time, a  number of factors converged to make moral relativism appear plausible.  These included a new appreciation of cultural diversity prompted by anthropological discoveries; the declining importance of religion in modernized societies; an increasingly critical attitude toward colonialism and its assumption of moral superiority over the colonized societies; and growing skepticism toward any form of moral objectivism, given the difficulty of proving value judgments the way one proves factual claims.

For some, moral relativism, which relativizes the truth of moral claims, follows logically from a broader cognitive relativism that relativizes truth in general.  Many moral relativists, however, take the fact-value distinction to be fundamental.  A common, albeit negative, reason for embracing moral relativism is simply the perceived untenability of moral objectivism: every attempt to establish a single, objectively valid and universally binding set of moral principles runs up against formidable objections.  A more positive argument sometimes advanced in defense of moral relativism is that it promotes tolerance since it encourages us to understand other cultures on their own terms.

Critics claim that relativists typically exaggerate the degree of diversity among cultures since superficial differences often mask underlying shared agreements.  In fact, some say that  there is a core set of universal values that any human culture must endorse if it is to flourish.  Moral relativists are also accused of inconsistently claiming that there are no universal moral norms while appealing to a principle of tolerance as a universal norm.  In the eyes of many critics, though, the most serious objection to moral relativism is that it implies the pernicious consequence that “anything goes”: slavery is just according to the norms of a slave society; sexist practices are right according to the values of a sexist culture. Without some sort of non-relative standard to appeal to, the critics argue, we have no basis for critical moral appraisals of our own culture’s conventions, or for judging one society to be better than another.  Naturally, most moral relativists typically reject the assumption that such judgments require a non-relativistic foundation.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
    1. Ancient Greece
    2. Modern Times
  2. Clarifying What Moral Relativism Is (and Is Not)
    1. Descriptive Relativism
    2. Cultural Relativism
    3. Ethical Non-Realism
    4. Ethical Non-Cognitivism
    5. Meta-Ethical Relativism
    6. Normative Relativism
    7. Moral Relativism
  3. Arguments for Moral Relativism
    1. The Argument from Cultural Diversity
    2. The Untenability of Moral Objectivism
    3. The Argument from Cognitive Relativism
    4. Moral Relativism Promotes Tolerance
  4. Objections to Moral Relativism
    1. Relativists Exaggerate Cultural Diversity
    2. Relativism Ignores Diversity Within a Culture
    3. Relativism Implies that Obvious Moral Wrongs are Acceptable
    4. Relativism Undermines the Possibility of a Society Being Self-Critical
    5. Relativism is Pragmatically Self-Refuting
    6. Relativism Rests on an Incoherent Notion of Truth
    7. The Relativist Position on Tolerance is Problematic
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background

a. Ancient Greece

In the view of most people throughout history, moral questions have objectively correct answers.  There are obvious moral truths just as there are obvious facts about the world.  Cowardice is a bad quality.  A man should not have sex with his mother.  Heroes deserve respect.  Such statements would be viewed as obviously and objectively true, no more open to dispute than the claim that seawater is salty.

This assumption was first challenged in fifth century B.C.E. Greece. The idea was that moral beliefs and practices are bound up with customs and conventions, and these vary greatly between societies.  The historian Herodotus tells the story of how the Persian king Darius asked some Greeks at his court if there was any price for which they would be willing to eat their dead father’s bodies the way the Callatiae did.  The Greeks said nothing could induce them to do this.  Darius then asked some Callatiae who were present if they would ever consider burning their fathers’ bodies, as was the custom among Greeks.  The Callatiae were horrified at the suggestion.  Herodotus sees this story as vindicating the poet Pindar’s dictum that “custom is lord of all”; people’s beliefs and practices are shaped by custom, and they typically assume that their own ways are the best.

Herodotus’ anecdote is not an isolated moment of reflection on cultural diversity and the conventional basis for morality.  The sophists—notably Protagoras, Gorgias, and some of their followers—were also associated with relativistic thinking.  As itinerant intellectuals and teachers, the sophists were cosmopolitan, impressed by and prompted to reflect upon the diversity in religions, political systems, laws, manners, and tastes they encountered in different societies.  Protagoras, who famously asserted that “man is the measure of all things,” seems to have embraced a wholesale relativism that extended to truth of any kind, but this view was uncommon.  More popular and influential was the contrast that many drew between nomos (law, custom) and physis (nature, natural order).  In Plato’sGorgias, for instance, Callicles, a student of Gorgias, argues that human laws and conventional notions about justice are at odds with what is right according to nature (which is that the strong should dominate the weak).  This view is not truly relativism, since it asserts a certain conception of justice as objectively correct, but Callicles’ stress on the merely conventional status of ordinary morality points the way towards relativism.

More radical is the position advanced by the sophist Thrasymachus in Book One of Plato’s Republic when he claims that “justice is nothing but the advantage of the stronger.” According to one interpretation, Thrasymachus is arguing that nothing is objectively right or wrong; moral language is simply a tool used by the powerful to justify the moral and legal systems that serve their interests. This view echoes the one expressed by the Athenians in Thucydides’ “Melian Dialogue” when they dismiss the Melian’s complaint that Athenian policy toward them is unjust.  So, relativistic thinking seems to have been in the air at the time.  Strictly speaking, it is a form of moral nihilism rather than moral relativism, but in rejecting the whole idea of objective moral truth it clears the ground for relativism.

Even though moral relativism makes its first appearance in ancient times, it hardly flourished.  Plato vigorously defended the idea of an objective moral order linked to a transcendent reality while Aristotle sought to ground morality on objective facts about human nature and well-being.  A few centuries later, Sextus Empiricus appears to have embraced a form of moral relativism, partly on the basis of the diversity of laws and conventions, and partly as a consequence of his Pyrrhonian skepticism that sought to eschew dogmatism. In his Outlines of Pyrrhonism, Sextus catalogues the tremendous diversity to be found between cultures in the laws and customs relating to such things as dress, diet, treatment of the dead, and sexual relations, and concludes: “seeing so great a diversity of practices, the skeptic suspends judgment as to the natural existence of anything good or bad, or generally to be done” (Sextus, Outlines of Pyrrhonism, 1, 14).  But Hellenistic skepticism gave way to philosophy informed by Christianity, and moral relativism effectively became dormant and remained so throughout the period of Christian hegemony in Europe. According to the monotheistic religions, God’s will represents an objective moral touchstone.  Scriptural precepts such as “Thou shalt not kill” constitute absolute, universally binding, moral truths.  Relativism thus ceased to be an option until the advent of modernity.

b. Modern Times


Many scholars see the first reappearance of a relativistic outlook in the writings of Montaigne, which, not coincidentally, came on the heels of the publication of Sextus’ writings in the 1560s.  In “On Custom,” Montaigne compiles his own list of radically diverse mores to be found in different societies, and asserts that “the laws of conscience which we say are born of Nature are born of custom.” (Montaigne, p. 83).  In his famous essay “On Cannibals,” written around 1578, Montaigne describes the lives of so-called barbarians in the new world, noting their bravery in battle, the natural simplicity of their morals, and their uncomplicated social structure.  “All this is not too bad,” he says, “but what’s the use?  They don’t wear breeches.”  The thrust of the essay is thus to criticize the ethnocentrism of the “civilized” Europeans who naively think themselves morally superior to such people.  Furthermore, Montaigne advances as a general thesis that “each man calls barbarism whatever is not his own practice; for indeed it seems we have no other test of truth and reason than the example and pattern of the opinions and customs of the country we live in” (Montaigne, p. 152).

In the centuries following, further trends in modern philosophy helped prepare the way for moral relativism by chipping away at people’s faith in the objectivity of ethics.  In the 17th century, Hobbes argued for a social contract view of morality that sees moral rules, like laws, as something human beings agree upon in order to make social living possible. An implication of this view is that moral tenets are not right or wrong according to whether they correspond to some transcendent blueprint; rather, they should be appraised pragmatically according to how well they serve their purpose.

Hume, like Montaigne, was heavily influenced by ancient skepticism, and this colors his view of morality.  His argument, that prescriptions saying how we should act cannot be logically derived from factual claims about the way things are, raised doubts about the possibility of proving the correctness of any particular moral point of view.  So, too, did his insistence that morality is based ultimately on feelings rather than on reason. Hume was not a relativist, but his arguments helped support elements of relativism.  With the remarkable progress of science in the 19th and 20th centuries, the fact-value distinction became entrenched in mainstream philosophy and social science.  Science came to be seen as offering value-neutral descriptions of an independently existing reality; moral claims, by contrast, came to be viewed by many as mere expressions of emotional attitudes.  This view of morality suggests that all moral outlooks are on the same logical plane, with none capable of being proved correct or superior to all the rest.

There are relativistic tendencies in Marx’s critique of bourgeois morality as an ideology expressing certain class interests.  According to one interpretation, Marx holds that there is no objectively true moral system, only interest-serving ideologies that use moral language.  But Marx wrote little about ethics, so it is hard to pin down his philosophical views about the nature of morality and the status of moral claims.

Nietzsche, on the other hand, wrote extensively and influentially about morality.  Scholars disagree about whether he should be classified as a relativist, but his thought certainly has a pronounced relativistic thrust.  His famous pronouncement that “God is dead” implies, among other things, that the idea of a transcendent or objective justification for moral claims—whether it be God, Platonic Forms, or Reason—is no longer credible.  And he explicitly embraces a form of perspectivism according to which “there are no moral phenomena, only moral interpretations of phenomena” (Beyond Good and Evil, 108).   It is true that Nietzsche likes to rank moralities according to whether they are expressions of strength or weakness, health or sickness; but he does not insist that the criteria of rank he favors constitute an objectively privileged vantage point from which different moralities can be appraised.

These philosophical ideas prepared the ground for moral relativism mainly by raising doubts about the possibility of demonstrating that any particular moral code is objectively correct.  But anthropological research in the 19th and 20th centuries also encouraged relativism.  Indeed, many of its leading contemporary champions from Franz Boas to Clifford Gertz have been anthropologists.

One of the first to argue at length for moral relativism was William Sumner. In his major work, Folkways, published in 1906, Sumner argues that notions about what is right and wrong are bound up with a society’s mores and are shaped by its customs, practices, and institutions.  To those living within that society, the concept of moral rightness can only mean conformity to the local mores.  Sumner acknowledges that if members of a culture generalize its mores into abstract principles, they will probably regard these as correct in an absolute sense. This may even be psychologically unavoidable.  But it is not philosophically legitimate; the mores themselves cannot be an object of moral appraisal since there is no higher tribunal to which appeals can be made.

The work of Franz Boas was also tremendously influential.  Boas viewed cultural relativism—a commitment to understanding a society in its own terms—as methodologically essential to scientific anthropology.  From an objective, scientific standpoint one may not pass moral judgment on the beliefs and practices that inhere within a culture, although one may objectively assess the extent to which they help that society achieve its overarching goals.  Many of Boas’ students helped disseminate this approach, and some, such as Melville Herskovits and Ruth Benedict, made more explicit its implications with respect to ethics, arguing that a relativistic outlook can help combat prejudice and promote tolerance.

The debate over moral relativism in modern times has thus not been an abstract discussion of interest only to professional philosophers.  It is thought to have implications for the social sciences, for international relations, and for relations between communities within a society.  In 1947, the American Anthropological Association submitted a statement to the UN Commission on Human Rights criticizing what some viewed as an attempt by the West to impose its particular values on other societies in the name of universal rights.  The statement declared that:

Standards and values are relative to the culture from which they derive so that any attempt to formulate postulates that grow out of the beliefs or moral codes of one culture must to that extent detract from the applicability of any Declaration of Human Rights to mankind as a whole (American Anthropologist, Vol. 49, No. 4, p. 542).

It went on to assert that “man is free only when he lives as his society defines freedom” (ibid. p. 543).  Needless to say, the statement caused some controversy since many members of the AAA did not agree with the position it laid out.

More recently, discussions of relativism have been at the center of debates about how societies with large immigrant populations should deal with the problem of multiculturalism.  To what extent should the practices of minorities be accepted, even if they seem to conflict with the values of the majority culture? In France, a law was passed in 2011 banning face veils that some Muslim women view as required by Islam.  Those supporting the ban appeal to values they consider universal such as sexual equality and freedom of expression (which the face veil is said to violate since it inhibits expressive interaction).  But critics of the policy see it as expressing a kind of cultural intolerance, just the sort of thing that relativism claims to counter.

2. Clarifying What Moral Relativism Is (and Is Not)

Defining moral relativism is difficult because different writers use the term in slightly different ways; in particular, friends and foes of relativism often diverge considerably in their characterization of it.  Therefore, it is important to first distinguish between some of the positions that have been identified or closely associated with moral relativism before setting out a definition that captures the main idea its adherents seek to put forward.

a. Descriptive Relativism

Descriptive relativism is a thesis about cultural diversity.  It holds that, as a matter of fact, moral beliefs and practices vary between cultures (and sometimes between groups within a single society).  For instance, some societies condemn homosexuality, others accept it; in some cultures a student who corrects a teacher would be thought disrespectful; elsewhere such behavior might be encouraged.

Descriptive relativism is put forward as an empirical claim based on evidence provided by anthropological research; hence it is most strongly associated with the work of anthropologists such as William Sumner, Ruth Benedict and Meville Herskovits.  There is a spectrum of possible versions of this thesis.  In its strongest, most controversial form, it denies that there are any moral universals—norms or values that every human culture endorses.  This extreme view is rarely, if ever, defended, since it seems reasonable to suppose that the affirmation of certain values—for instance, a concern for the wellbeing of the young-- is necessary for any society to survive.  But Benedict seems to approach it when she writes of the three societies she describes in Patterns of Culture that "[t]hey are oriented as wholes in different directions….traveling along different roads in pursuit of different ends and these ends and these means in one society cannot be judged in terms of those of another society, because essentially they are incommensurable" (Patterns of Culture, p. 206).  In its weakest, least controversial form, descriptive relativism merely denies that all cultures share the same moral outlook.  A well-known version of this has been defended by David Wong, who describes his position as “pluralistic relativism.”

The somewhat simple form of descriptive relativism, which takes any differences between the moral beliefs or practices of two cultures as evidence of a difference in moral outlooks, has been heavily criticized both by social scientists such as Solomon Asch and by philosophers such as Michele Moody-Adams.  One objection is that it is difficult to establish the relativist’s claims about moral diversity in an evaluatively neutral way; for the empirical researcher who asserts that a particular moral belief is representative of a culture will have to grant the opinions of some members of that culture authoritative status while ignoring or glossing over internal conflicts and ongoing cultural changes. Another objection is that many apparent moral differences between cultures are not really fundamental disagreements about questions of value—that is, disagreements that would persist even if both parties were in full agreement about all the pertinent facts.   For instance, the taboo against homosexuality in some cultures may rest on the belief that homosexuality is a sin against God that will result in the sinner suffering eternal damnation.  The point of conflict between these cultures and those that tolerate homosexuality may thus be viewed as being, fundamentally, not about the intrinsic rightness or wrongness of homosexuality but the different factual beliefs they hold concerning the consequences of homosexuality.

In light of such difficulties, contemporary defenders of descriptive relativism usually prefer a fairly modest, tempered version of the doctrine.  Wong, for instance, holds that human nature and the human condition set limits to how much moral systems could diverge while still counting as true moralities; but he argues that the experience of “moral ambivalence”—which occurs when one disagrees with another person’s moral views yet recognizes that their position is reasonable—is nevertheless common and usually arises when the parties put shared values in a different order of priority.

b. Cultural Relativism


Cultural relativism asserts that the beliefs and practices of human beings are best understood by grasping them in relation to the cultural context in which they occur.  It was originally put forward as, and remains today, a basic methodological principle of modern anthropology.  It was championed by anthropologists like Sumner and Boas who saw it as an antidote of the unconscious ethnocentrism that may lead social scientists to misunderstand the phenomena they are observing.  For instance, ritualistic infliction of pain may look, on the surface, like a punishment aimed at deterring others from wrongdoing; but it may in fact be viewed by those involved in the practice as serving a quite different function, such as purging the community of an impurity.

Ironically, an extension of this argument in favor of the view that what appears on the surface to be similar acts can have different “situational meanings” has been used as an objection to descriptive relativism.  Thus, Gestalt psychologist Karl Duncker, argued that the action by an Eskimo of killing his aged parent, where this is socially sanctioned as a way to spare their suffering, is not the same act as the killing of a parent in a society where such an action would generally be condemned as murder.  Since the meaning of each act differs, we should not infer that the values of the two societies are necessarily in conflict.

The term cultural relativism is sometimes also used to denote the corollary methodological principle that social scientists, if they wish their work to have scientific status, should describe and analyze what goes on in the cultures they are studying, carefully eschewing any normative appraisal of what they observe.

c. Ethical Non-Realism

Ethical non-realism is the view that there is no objective moral order that makes our moral beliefs true or false and our actions right or wrong.  The term “objective” employed here is notoriously difficult to explicate; it means something like “independent of human desires, perceptions, beliefs and practices” (although the meaning of the term “independent” is equally hard to pin down).  According to an ethical realist, a sentence like “slavery is wrong” is true or false regardless of the speaker’s state of mind or the norms prevailing in his or her community.  This is the view held by most philosophers in the Western canon from Plato and Aristotle to Kant, Mill, and G. E. Moore.  It continues to be widely held, and leading contemporary defenders of ethical realism include Thomas Nagel, John McDowell, and Richard Boyd.

Ethical non-realists obviously reject ethical realism, but not all for the same reasons; consequently there are several types of ethical non-realism.  The most head-on rejection of ethical realism is perhaps the sort of moral error theory defended by J. L. Mackie.  He argues that all moral claims are, strictly speaking, false since they posit properties (for example, goodness, wrongness, fairness) that are “ontologically queer” in being quite unlike any of the properties of things that we can perceive by normal empirical means.  In the absence of any special faculty for detecting such properties, and therefore of any real evidence for their existence, we should conclude that they don’t exist; hence all statements that assert or presuppose that they exist are false.

A skeptical attitude toward moral realism can be more tentative than this.  Hume is often interpreted as a moral skeptic who denies the possibility of proving by reason or by empirical evidence the truth of moral statements since our moral views rest entirely on our feelings.  More recently, Michael Ruse, has defended an updated version of Hume, arguing that we are conditioned by evolution to hold fast to certain moral beliefs, regardless of the evidence for or against them; consequently, we should not view such beliefs as rationally justified.  And Walter Sinnott-Armstrong has shown how difficult it is to refute moral skepticism, especially the sort of non-dogmatic Pyrrhonian skepticism which holds that one may be justified within a restricted context in affirming a certain moral belief—for instance, in court it is wrong to lie as opposed to telling the truth—yet not be able to justify the claim that lying, or even perjury, is wrong in some absolute, objective sense.

Ethical non-realism is typically presupposed by moral relativists, but it is not the whole of moral relativism.  Clearly, no one who believes in the absolute authority of divine law or the intrinsic value of a rational will would be likely to embrace relativism.  But merely denying that morality has an objective foundation of this sort does not make one a relativist; for moral relativism also asserts that moral claims may be true or false relative to some particular standpoint such as that of a specific culture or historical period.

d. Ethical Non-Cognitivism

Ethical non-cognitivism is the view that moral judgments are neither true nor false since they are not “truth-apt,” meaning they are not the kind of utterances that can have a truth-value. In this respect they are like questions or commands rather than like indicative sentences such as “Grass is green.” The most common kinds of ethical non-cognitivism in the twentieth century are forms of expressivism which view moral statements as expressions of evaluative attitudes.  An especially influential version of this view, first put forward by Ogden and Richards, and later elaborated upon by A.J. Ayer and C.L. Stevenson, is emotivism. According to emotivism, moral judgments express the speaker’s feelings towards the thing being judged. So, saying “Nelson Mandela is a good man” expresses approval of Mandela; it is like saying “Hurrah for Mandela!”  Other forms of ethical non-cognitivism have built on this idea.  Prescriptivism, for instance, the view developed by R. M. Hare, acknowledges that moral statements can express emotional attitudes but sees their primary function as that of prescribing how people should behave.  Thus, “stealing is wrong” is a way of saying “Don’t steal!” More recent versions of expressivism however, such as Simon Blackburn’s “quasi-realism,” hold that while moral claims are not, strictly speaking, true or false, we are justified in treating them as if they are, both in our ethical reasoning and in our practice.

Most forms of ethical non-cognitivism, like moral relativism, have been fueled by acceptance of a fact-value gap. But unlike ethical non-cognitivism, moral relativism does not deny that moral claims can be true; it only denies that they can be made true by some objective, trans-cultural moral order.  It allows them to be true in the humbler, relativistic sense of being rationally acceptable from a particular cultural vantage point.

e. Meta-Ethical Relativism

Meta-ethical relativism holds that moral judgments are not true or false in any absolute sense, but only relative to particular standpoints.  This idea is essential to just about any version of moral relativism.  Relativizing truth to standpoints is a way of answering in advance the objection that relativism implies that the same sentence can be both true and false.  The relativity clause means that the same sentence—say, “slavery is unjust”—can be both true and false, but not in exactly the same sense, since the term “unjust” contains an implicit reference to some particular normative framework.  The situation is analogous to that in which one person says “It is raining” and another person says “It is not raining.”  If they are standing together at the same place and at the same time, they cannot both be right.  But if they are speaking at different times or from different locations (standpoints) this is possible.

Saying that the truth of a moral claim is relative to some standpoint should not be confused with the idea that it is relative to the situation in which it is made.  Only the most extreme rigorists would deny that in assessing a moral judgment we should take the particular circumstances into account.  Most people would agree that lying in court to avoid a fine is wrong, while lying to a madman to protect his intended victim is justified. The particular circumstances surrounding the action alter its character and hence our appraisal of it.

Some meta-ethical relativists focus more on the justification of moral judgments rather than on their truth.  Gilbert Harman, for instance, argues that when we say someone ought to do something, we imply that she has a “motivating reason”—that is, certain desires and intentions--to perform the act in question.  But whether or not the person has these desires and intentions, and hence feels obliged to perform the action, is largely determined by the prevailing norms of the community to which she belongs.  Feelings of moral obligation provide a justification for particular beliefs and practices; but these only arise through agents being embedded in particular social groups whose moral outlook they share.

Most moral relativists endorse some version of meta-ethical relativism.  But meta-ethical relativism is not quite fully-fledged moral relativism; for one could consistently affirm it and still insist that one particular standpoint was demonstrably superior to all others. It is the denial of this possibility that gives moral relativism a more radical edge and is responsible for much of the criticism it attracts.

f. Normative Relativism

Normative relativism is the view that it is wrong to judge or interfere with the moral beliefs and practices of cultures that operate with a different moral framework to one’s own, that what goes on in a society should only be judged by the norms of that society.  It is a prescriptive position adopted initially by many anthropologists reacting against the ethnocentrism characteristic of the colonial era.  Melvelle Herskovits, for instance, affirms that “… in practice, the philosophy of relativism is a philosophy of tolerance” (Cultural Relativism, p. 31).  Similar claims can be found in the writings of Ruth Benedict and Edvard Westermarck.

Because it is prescriptive, many would say that what is being described here is not really a form of relativism but is, rather, a position entailed by moral relativism.  The motive behind it is to avoid arrogance and promote tolerance.  But normative relativists can also argue that judging other cultures is misguided since there are no trans-cultural criteria to which one can refer in order to justify one’s judgment.  Whether or not meta-ethical relativism entails normative relativism is a major bone of contention.  Bernard Williams disparages with the label “vulgar relativism” the sort of thinking that simplistically infers tolerance from relativity.  Geoffrey Harrison argues that while moral relativism, properly understood, is essentially a meta-ethical position about morality, the claim that we should be tolerant is one made from within a particular moral point of view; the latter does not follow the former, therefore, since they belong to different levels of discourse.  And David Wong, while defending both meta-ethical and normative relativism, agrees that the former does not, by itself, entail the latter, some sort of independent principle of liberal political theory being also needed to support a non-interventionist position.

g. Moral Relativism

Moral relativism has been identified with all the above positions; and no formula can capture all the ways the term is used by both its advocates and its critics.  But it is possible to articulate a position that most who call themselves moral relativists would endorse.

1.  Moral judgments are true or false and actions are right or wrong only relative to some particular standpoint (usually the moral framework of a specific community).

2.  No standpoint can be proved objectively superior to any other.

According to this view, “slavery is unjust” is true relative to the moral framework of most 21st century Norwegians, but it is false relative to the moral perspective of most white Americans in South Carolina in the 18th century.  Regarding the second clause in the definition, moral philosophers from the time of Plato have sought to demonstrate the objective correctness (and hence the superiority) of a given moral outlook by showing how it conforms to God’s will, or corresponds to a metaphysical moral order, or is entailed by dictates of Reason, or accords with basic intuitions, or best meets the needs of human nature.  According to the moral relativist, all such attempts fail, for they all rest on premises that belong to the standpoint being defended and need not be accepted by people who do not share that point of view.

Thus, a critic of slavery could no doubt prove the truth of what she says to anyone who accepts her basic premises—for example, that all races are equally human, and that all human beings should enjoy the same basic rights.  But the argument will not convince someone who denies these premises.  To them, such a “proof” of slavery’s wrongness will appear question begging, and they can reject it without being inconsistent or irrational.

The fact that one moral outlook cannot be conclusively proved superior to another does not mean, however, that it cannot be judged superior; nor does it imply that one cannot give reasons for preferring it. Gilbert Harman, for instance, holds that he can consistently affirm basic tenets of liberal morality while recognizing that his reasons for doing so may not be “motivating reasons” to someone belonging to a different moral culture, and so will have no persuasive power.  A moderate moral relativist like David Wong argues that some moralities are better than others on the grounds that they better serve the needs and purposes that people in all cultures share.  But within the parameters imposed by the common human condition, significant variation in moral outlook is possible.  For instance, between the individualistic ways of thinking that are characteristic of the modern West and the community-centered outlooks more typical of Asia—to take an example Wong considers in depth—one can express a preference, but one cannot justify it by appealing to neutral criteria of superiority. Thomas Scanlon, an even milder kind of relativist, also defends the idea that one can view another society’s moral norms as worthy of respect while still having cogent reasons for preferring one’s own.

Moral relativists typically relativize the truth of moral judgments to cultures, which may encompass an entire society or historical period (China, Victorian England) but can also designate a subculture within a society (the Pennsylvania Amish, urban street gangs).  In principle, the standpoint in question could be narrowed to that of a single individual, in which case, the relativism becomes a form of moral subjectivism.  But this is not a widely held position since it seems to reduce to the idea that whatever an individual believes to be right is right, and that would seem to undermine the whole idea of morality.

3. Arguments for Moral Relativism

The main arguments for moral relativism are not necessarily all compatible.  For instance, some relativists presuppose that value judgments are fundamentally different from factual judgments (which can be objectively true), while others see the truth of both kinds of judgment as irreducibly relative to some conceptual or cultural framework.  The arguments given here thus represent different routes by which one may arrive at a relativistic view of morality.

a. The Argument from Cultural Diversity

Textbooks often suggest that relativists argue from the plain fact that different cultures have different moral belief systems to a relativistic view of morality; but this is an oversimplification. The path seems to be more along the following lines.  Awareness of the existence of diverse moralities (a) casts doubt on the idea that there is a single true morality, and (b) encourages the idea that the morality of one’s own culture has no special status but is just one moral system among many.

The fact of diversity—if it is a fact, which some question (see section 4a below)—does not logically entail moral relativism.  It does not even entail that objectivism is false.  After all, there are diverse views on how human beings came to exist, but that does not imply that there is no single, objectively correct account.  Nor can moral relativism really claim to explain the diversity of moral systems, although this claim is sometimes made on its behalf.  For how can the mere absence of something—in this case, an objective and universally binding moral code—explain the phenomenon in question?  The suggestion seems to rest on the premise that if there were an objective moral truth, there would not be such moral diversity.  Presumably, the idea underlying this premise is that cultures would have by now converged on the objective moral truth.  But the absence of an objective truth does not explain this lack of convergence.  At most, it is merely a condition that makes diversity more likely.  Cultures have different sporting preferences: Brazilians love soccer; Pakistanis prefer cricket; Mongolians are passionate about horse racing.  But no one would suggest that these differences are explained by the absence of a single, objectively superior game that everyone should play.

To be sure, an objectivist has to explain why so many people seem to have failed to discover the one true moral code, while relativists are excused from this task.  But explanations referencing the usual suspects—ignorance, habit, tradition, unreason, fear, self-interest, and so on—are possible.

Thus, diversity by itself proves very little.  Relativists nevertheless see it as suggestive, often pointing to an analogy between moralities and religions.  The existence of many different religions does not prove that none of them can claim to be the one true religion.  But it obviously does raise the question of how the objective truth of any religion could possibly be demonstrated.  And in the case of moralities, too, the question arises: how is it possible to prove that one is superior to all the others?

b. The Untenability of Moral Objectivism

The untenability of moral objectivism is probably the most popular and persuasive justification for moral relativism--that it follows from the collapse of moral objectivism, or is at least the best alternative to objectivism. The argument obviously rests on the idea that moral objectivism has been discredited.  In its oldest and most widespread form, the idea that a moral code has objective validity rests on the belief that it has some sort of divine sanction.  With the decline in religious faith that is a hallmark of modernity, this foundation for morality was shaken.  Consequently, much moral philosophy from the 17th century onwards has been devoted to establishing an alternative, secular foundation, one that can claim universal validity without appealing to dubious metaphysical doctrines. This is what Alasdair MacIntyre has dubbed the “enlightenment project.”

But despite the efforts of Kant, Mill, and their successors, many remain skeptical about the possibility of proving the objective truth or the universal validity of moral claims.  The fact that the moral objectivists themselves cannot agree about which moral system is correct, or what its philosophical foundation should be, encourages this skepticism. But it also rests on forceful philosophical considerations.  Moral judgments, say the critics of objectivism, have an irreducible evaluative component.  They assert, assume, or imply that a state of affairs is good or bad, that an action is right or wrong, or that something is better than something else.  But if one accepts—as many do—that value judgments are logically distinct from factual statements and cannot be derived from them, then any attempt to justify a moral claim must rest on at least some value-laden premises. And these basic moral presuppositions will not be susceptible to proof at all.

For example, an argument to prove that a husband should not beat his wife will probably rest on the assumption that men and women should enjoy equal rights.  But how does one prove this to someone who categorically denies it?  How does one prove that the intrinsic value of happiness should be the foundation of our moral judgments to someone who thinks that family honor is the most important value of all?  Or how does one prove that individual rights are a primary good to someone whose theoretical bottom line is that individuals should be subservient to the state?

The increase in skepticism towards moral objectivism is one of the most significant shifts that has taken place in moral philosophy over the past two centuries.  This trend has been reinforced by the apparent contrast between natural science and moral discourse. Science is generally thought to describe an independently existing, objective reality; and scientists from all over the world largely accept the same methodology, data, theories and conclusions, except in the case of disputes at the cutting edge of research.  Ethics exhibits nothing like this degree of convergence. Gilbert Harman is one of the best-known defenders of moral relativism along these lines.  But other critics of objectivism, such as Alasdair MacIntrye and Richard Rorty, have carved out relativistic positions that don’t rest on acceptance of a sharp distinction between facts and values.

Moral relativism is not the only response to the perceived problems with moral objectivism.  As noted earlier, ethical non-realism, ethical non-cognitivism, emotivism, moral subjectivism, and moral skepticism are other possible responses, for the mere denial of objectivism, like the mere fact of cultural diversity, does not logically entail moral relativism.  It does, however, undoubtedly make people more receptive to a relativistic outlook.

c. The Argument from Cognitive Relativism

The majority of moral relativists do not embrace cognitive relativism, which offers a relativistic account of truth in general, not just the truth of moral judgments.  However, some do, and this is another path to moral relativism

One of the merits of this approach to moral relativism is that it can help to clarify fundamental questions about what is meant by talk about the relativity of moral claims.  What does it mean, after all, to say that moral norms are “relative to” some culture?  If we are merely saying that what people think about right and wrong is influenced by the cultural environment, then the claim seems banal.  If we are saying that moral beliefs and practices are causally determined by the surrounding culture, then unless one is a strict determinist, the thesis seems to be obviously false; for members raised in the same cultural community can adopt very different moral outlooks.  The philosophically interesting claim at the heart of most forms of moral relativism is that moral statements are true (or false) relative to some normative standpoint, usually one characteristic of some particular culture.  But what does “true relative to” mean, precisely?  From an objectivist or realist point of view, the phrase makes little sense since what determines the truth or falsity of a statement is whether or not it accords with objective reality.  The cognitive relativist, however, argues that this notion of truth is philosophically vacuous since it employs the notion of an independent, objective reality that lies beyond any possible experience.

Cognitive relativism holds that (a) the truth value of any judgment is relative to some particular standpoint (for example, a conceptual scheme or theoretical framework); and (b) no standpoint is metaphysically privileged over all others—there is no “God’s eye point of view” that yields the objective truth about reality.  Relativists of this sort are not so impressed by the fact-value distinction.  They do not view truth as a property that sentences possess in virtue of their correspondence to an independent reality.  Rather, they argue that we call a sentence “true” when it coheres with the rest of our beliefs, perceptions, values, and assumptions—in other words, when it is rationally acceptable or appears justified according to our general conceptual scheme.  On this view, “the earth moves around the sun” is false relative to a medieval conceptual scheme and is true relative to ours.  Similarly, “homosexuality is morally wrong” is true relative to the perspective of conservative Christians and false relative to that of twenty-first century liberals.  There is no essential difference between the two cases.  And in both cases, it is not possible to demonstrate logically the superiority of one standpoint over the other.

This is more or less the position defended by Richard Rorty, even though he rejects the relativist label.  Rorty likes to describe himself as following in the footsteps of William James and John Dewey, although his interpretation of his pragmatist predecessors is controversial.  According to him, the term “true” is an “empty compliment” we pay to statements that we consider sufficiently well supported by the network of other assumptions, beliefs, and experiences that surround them.

d. Moral Relativism Promotes Tolerance

The idea that moral relativism promotes tolerance is a normative argument.   The key idea is that moral relativism encourages a certain humility.  Becoming aware of the merely relative validity of one’s own moral norms makes one less likely to fall into arrogant ethnocentrism and less inclined to pass moral judgment on the beliefs and practices found in other cultures.  In effect, the argument is that moral relativism entails normative relativism (see above).  Ruth Benedict states the idea forcefully at the end of her influential work Patterns of Culture, when she expresses her hope that, on the basis of the sort of anthropological research she has described, “we shall arrive at a more realistic social faith, accepting as grounds of hope and as new bases for tolerance the coexisting and equally valid patterns of life which mankind has created for itself from the raw materials of existence" (Patterns of Culture, p. 257). Benedict, in fact, takes the argument a step further, arguing that the relativistic outlook she champions can be positively beneficial in helping to combat bigotry, racism, chauvinism and other forms of prejudice.

One reason for thinking that a relativistic view of morality might foster tolerance is that it will also incline us to be more self-critical.  Edvard Westermarck makes this connection in his 1932 work Ethical Relativity when he says, “Could it be brought home to people that there is no absolute standard in morality, they would perhaps be on the one hand more tolerant and on the other more critical in their judgments” (Ethical Relativity, p. 59).  As mentioned earlier, however, even some thinkers sympathetic to relativism, such as Harrison and Wong, are suspicious of the claim that moral relativism by itself necessarily entails a tolerant attitude toward alternative moralities. And critics of relativism, such as W.T. Stace and Karl Popper, argue that if relativism does indeed imply universal tolerance, that this constitutes an objection to it, since some things—like oppressively intolerant moral systems—should not be tolerated (see section 4g below).

4. Objections to Moral Relativism

a. Relativists Exaggerate Cultural Diversity


The objection that relativists exaggerate cultural diversity is directed against descriptive relativism more than against moral relativism as defined above; but it has figured importantly in many debates about relativism.  In its simplest form, the argument runs as follows.  Every human culture has some sort of moral code, and these overlap to a considerable extent.  There is a common core of shared values such as trustworthiness, friendship, and courage, along with certain prohibitions, such as those against murder or incest. Some version of the golden rule—treat others as you would have them treat you—is also encountered in almost every society. The existence of these universal values is easy to explain: they enable societies to flourish, and their absence would jeopardize a society’s chances of survival.

The claim that every society must share these basic commitments thus links up with findings in evolutionary ethics.  It is also supported, according to some, by the results of the “moral sense test,” a research project conducted by Harvard’s Primate and Cognitive Neuroscience Laboratory.  The project is an internet-based study of the moral intuitions of people from all over the world.  The responses are sufficiently uniform, according to the laboratory’s director, Mark Hauser, to support the idea that there is a “universally shared moral faculty” common to all human beings and rooted in our evolutionary heritage.  Such universalist claims are sometimes cited by those seeking to establish a generally agreed upon set of human rights or human capacities, a foundation for the work of organizations and bodies like the United Nations.

The argument that relativists exaggerate the diversity among moral systems is also advanced in a subtler form, an early version of which can be found in the Dialogue that Hume appended to his Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals.  What appear to be striking differences in moral outlook turn out, on closer examination, to be superficial disagreements masking underlying common values.  For example, some nomadic cultures have considered infanticide to be morally acceptable, while in other societies it is viewed as murder. But those carrying out infanticide may be motivated by the knowledge that they lack the resources to support the child.  Their action is thus prompted by a concern for the well being of the community, and perhaps, also, a desire that the child be spared avoidable suffering—values that would be recognized and approved by people in other societies where, since additional children would be less of a burden, infanticide is prohibited.  In this case, the apparent difference in values is explained by the different circumstances of the societies in question.

Other seeming differences may be explained by reference to the different factual beliefs that people hold. Take the issue of slavery.  Some societies have seen nothing wrong with slavery; others view it is a moral abomination.  This would seem to mark a basic and serious disparity in moral perspectives.  Yet both parties may subscribe to the principle that “all men are created equal.”  Their disagreement may be over whether or not the people being enslaved are fully human.  And defenders of slavery in the United States did indeed used to argue that blacks were sub-human and could therefore legitimately be treated like animals rather than as human beings.

The critics of relativism thus argue that before declaring a moral difference between cultures to be fundamental we should look carefully to see whether the difference does not, at bottom, arise out of disparate living conditions or rest on conflicting factual beliefs.

The question of whether or not there are universal values has been at the center of many of the debates about moral relativism.  But the expression “universal values” is ambiguous, and how it is understood affects the kind of relativism that it calls into question.

(i) “Universal values” can mean moral values or norms to which every culture, as a matter of fact, is committed.  If there are universal values in this sense, then it is an objection to a strong version of descriptive relativism which sees cultural diversity as sufficiently radical to preclude any common ground that all cultures share.  It is worth noting that descriptive relativism would also become false in the event of humanity eventually converging on a single moral outlook or of a catastrophe that wiped out all cultures except one.  But neither scenario would falsify moral relativism as defined above, since it is not an empirical theory about anyone’s actual beliefs or practices; it is, rather, a view about the status of moral judgments and the limitations on how they can be supported.

(ii) “Universal values” can mean moral values or norms that everyone ought to affirm.  This is a normative universalism.  It is likely that most who hold this view see these universal values as constitutive of an objectively correct moral point of view. Understood in this way, the position is incompatible with relativism.  But the view that there are, as a matter of fact, universally shared values does not entail this normative universalism.  After all, every society might agree that homosexuality is wicked or that men should have dominion over women.  It would not follow that everyone should embrace these values.

b. Relativism Ignores Diversity Within a Culture


When relativists say that the truth of moral claims and the rightness of actions is relative to the norms and values of the culture in which they occur, they seem to assume that members of that culture will generally agree about the moral framework which they supposedly share.  This may sometimes be the case; but such homogeneous and relatively static cultures are increasingly uncommon.  Today, many cultures contain sub-communities that disagree sharply on matters such as abortion, capital punishment, euthanasia, polygamy, women’s rights, gay rights, drug use, or the treatment of animals.  Given that this is so, which set of norms and values are we supposed to refer to when judging a belief or practice?  If the relevant norms are those of the sub-culture to which the person making the claim belongs, then the relativist position seems in danger of spiraling down toward subjectivism, since there can be many sub-cultures, and some of them can be quite small.

From the other direction comes the objection that relativists tend to ignore the extent to which cultures overlap and influence one another.  These criticisms are related, as both accuse relativists of presupposing an oversimplified and outdated view of what a culture is.  This charge seems to have some purchase on the sort of relativism that treats the validity of moral claims as relative to specific identifiable cultures.  It seems less damaging, though, to the kind of relativism that relates moral claims to general normative standpoints without requiring that these be identified with actual communities.

c. Relativism Implies that Obvious Moral Wrongs are Acceptable



The most serious objection to moral relativism is that relativism implies that obvious moral wrongs are acceptable.  The objection is that if we say beliefs and actions are right or wrong only relative to a specific moral standpoint, it then becomes possible to justify almost anything.  We are forced to abandon the idea that some actions are just plain wrong. Nor can we justify the idea that some forms of life are obviously and uncontroversially better than others, even though almost everyone believes this.  According to the relativists, say the critics, the beliefs of slave-owners and Nazis should be deemed true and their practices right relative to their conceptual-moral frameworks; and it is not possible for anyone to prove that their views are false or morally misguided, or that there are better points of view.  To many, this is a reductio ad absurdum of moral relativism.

This line of attack appears compelling against normative relativism, the view that what goes on within a society should only be judged by the prevailing norms of that society.  If that is one’s position, then one must hold that in a culture where, say, adulterers are stoned to death, this practice is morally right, since it is justified according to the only norms that matter— those of the society in question.  The argument is less persuasive, however, against the position identified as “moral relativism” in section 2 above, since this version of relativism allows the beliefs and practices within a culture to be judged according to norms external to that culture.  With this view, stoning adulterers is right relative to some moral standpoints (for instance, that of ancient Israel) and wrong according to others (for instance, that of modern liberalism).  So relativists who happen to be liberal-minded denizens of the modern world are still free to judge what goes on elsewhere by their own moral norms.  What makes their position relativistic is their denial that there is any neutral, transcultural court of appeal to provide an objective justification for preferring one standpoint over another.

To many critics, however, this denial is precisely what renders relativism unacceptable.  In their view, both versions of relativism put all moralities on the same plane and make one’s choice between them arbitrary.  In responding to this criticism, moral relativists would seem to have three options.

(i) Assert that all moralities are indeed on the same plane and we have no reasons for favoring some over others.  However, virtually no one takes this position since it amounts to a form of moral nihilism.

(ii) Argue that the beliefs and practices of a culture should be appraised according to how well they enable that culture to realize the goals it sets for itself.  This allows for an assessment that avoids judging according to an external standard.  True, the general criterion of efficiency or success being used here could be called transcultural; but the relativist can plausibly argue that the criterion is one that every culture would accept; for to reject it would amount to saying that one did not care whether one’s society flourished or failed.

However, for the relativists, this line of defense only sets the problem back a step.  The critic will next pose the question: Regarding the goals societies set for themselves, do we have any reason for preferring some goals over others?  Suppose a society’s overarching goals include realizing racial purity or achieving world domination.  If relativists allow for no way of appraising such goals, insisting that any preferences we express are arbitrary, then, the critics will say, their position is once more shown to be beyond the pale of common sense.

(iii) A third option for relativists is to embrace what might be called (following Richard Rorty) an “ethnocentric” position.  Relativists of this stripe continue to insist that all moralities are in the same boat insofar as none can be conclusively proved in some absolute sense to be true or false, right or wrong, or better than any other available moral outlook.  But, they argue, it does not follow from this that relativists cannot consistently prefer some moralities over others, nor that they cannot offer reasons for their preference.  They simply admit that when they appraise moralities, they do so according to norms and values constitutive of their particular moral standpoint, one that they probably share with most other members of their cultural community.   Thus, a relativist might condemn laws prohibiting homosexuality in the name of such values as happiness, freedom, and equality.  But she does not claim that she can prove that this normative standpoint is objectively superior to that of the culture outlawing homosexuality.  Possibly those she is criticizing might share her values, in which case they may be open to persuasion.  But they might have different basic values; for instance, they may favor executing homosexuals in order to realize a certain vision of moral purity.  In that case, the standoff seems to be at the level of fundamental values.  And when that is the case, the relativist may accept that she cannot demonstrate the objective superiority of her views in a non question-begging way—that is, without making assumptions that those she is trying to persuade will reject.

To the critic, moral relativism implies that one moral view is just as good or as bad as any other, and to take this line is to countenance immorality.  But the difference between Western academics who are moral relativists and their fellow academics who criticize them is clearly not a deep difference in moral values.  They all are likely to praise democracy and condemn discrimination.  The difference is, rather, at the meta-ethical level in their view of the status of moral judgments and the kind of justification they allow.  The critics believe some sort of objective bulwark is needed to prevent the slide toward an “anything goes” form of moral nihilism.  The relativists see this anxiety as mistaken since what it asks for is both impossible and unnecessary. In their view, an “ethnocentric” justification of one’s views is the only kind available, and it is enough.

d. Relativism Undermines the Possibility of a Society Being Self-Critical

If the rightness or wrongness of actions, practices, or institutions can only be judged by reference to the norms of the culture in which they are found, then how can members of that society criticize those norms on moral grounds?  And how can they argue that the prevailing norms should be changed?   If, for instance, a society has a caste system under which one caste enjoys great privileges while another caste is allowed to do only menial work, then this system will necessarily appear just according to its own norms. So there will be nothing to criticize.

One apparent way for the relativist to avoid this objection is to point out that most societies are imperfect even by their own lights; what actually happens usually falls short of the ideals espoused.  For instance, an official commitment to equality is belied by discriminatory laws. Thus, a society can be self-critical by noticing gaps between its practices and its ideals.  This is a weak response, however, since the sort of self-criticism it allows is quite limited.  Often, the most important kind of self-criticism involves a demand that the ideals themselves be changed, as, for instance, when the American and French revolutions articulated new egalitarian values.  Can moral relativism make sense of a society’s own members rejecting the prevailing norms?

The answer is that it all depends on the precise sort of moral relativism being espoused.  If the particular standpoint, by reference to which moral claims are appraised, has to be that constituted by the prevailing norms in a society, then it is hard to see how those norms themselves can be criticized.  But if the relativist only insists that moral claims are true or false relative to some particular standpoint, then this does not follow.  In that case, the prevailing moral norms can be judged wrong from an alternative point of view, which may be the one the relativist favors.  For instance, the current treatment of animals on American factory farms could be criticized by an American relativist who adopts the standpoint of a utilitarian committed to the minimization of unnecessary suffering.

Closely related to the argument concerning a society’s capacity for self-criticism is the objection that moral relativism implies there is no such thing as moral progress.  A society may change its norms by, say, ending systematic discrimination against certain groups, or becoming less indifferent to the suffering of animals.  But if there is no neutral point of view from which such changes can be appraised, how can one argue that they constitute progress?  Indeed, from the point of view of the old norms, any changes must appear suspect, since the old norms dictate what is right.

Like the previous objection, this argument has the form of a reductio ad absurdum.  Almost everyone believes that moral progress can and does occur within a society.  The abolition of slavery is a paradigm of such progress.  So, any theory implying that such changes do not constitute progress must be false.  By the same token, moral relativism can also be criticized for not allowing the possibility of moral decline, which also presumably occurs at times.

One response a relativist could offer to this objection is simply to embrace the conclusion and insist that moral progress is a chimera; but this undeniably goes against what most people view as ethical common sense. The more common and more plausible response, therefore, is, once again, for the relativist to take the “ethnocentric” line.  On this view, moral progress is possible, but not relative to objective, trans-cultural criteria.  It can only be gauged by reference to some particular moral standpoint that cannot be conclusively proved superior to other points of view.  Thus, relativists, like everyone else, will view the abolition of slavery as progress because they affirm values such as freedom, equality, and individual happiness. They simply deny that it represents progress in some more objective sense—from “the God’s eye point of view,” so to speak.

e. Relativism is Pragmatically Self-Refuting

A standard objection to cognitive relativism, which is sometimes advanced against moral relativism, is that it is pragmatically self-refuting.  The basic idea behind it is that moral relativists, whatever their official meta-ethical position, cannot avoid being implicitly committed to certain fundamental norms and values, and they presuppose this commitment in the very act of arguing for moral relativism. So, the content of the theory is at odds with the practice of affirming or defending it.  Jürgen Habermas develops this line of argument by claiming that anyone participating in rational discourse reveals, through that very act, a commitment to certain values that belong to a normative notion of rationality: for instance, values such as sincerity or open-mindedness.

Relativists, however, are likely to be skeptical about the universality of these alleged implicit commitments.  To them, the concept of rationality in question is characteristic of a particular time and place.  To be sure, they may, as modern Western liberals, embrace values such as sincerity or open-mindedness.  But they can still plausibly deny that they have an objective duty to do so, or that such values are necessarily embedded in all acts of communication and must therefore be viewed as universal.

f. Relativism Rests on an Incoherent Notion of Truth

What does it mean for a moral belief to be true relative to a particular culture?  If it merely means that most members of that culture hold that belief, then it is a somewhat grandiose and misleading way of stating a simple fact.  Presumably, therefore, relativists mean something more by it. In addition, they cannot be simply making the banal point that someone belonging to that culture who rejects the belief in question is in the minority, or is perceived to be mistaken by the majority.  The relativist thesis seems to be that in some sense the truth (or falsity) of a person’s moral beliefs is either determined by or constituted by their coherence (or lack of coherence) with the prevailing moral outlook in that person’s community.  This raises a number of awkward issues.  It seems to imply, for instance, that the majority can never be wrong on moral matters.  And a corollary of that is that within a given community, dissidents must always be wrong.  These ideas go against our normal ways of thinking.

A further problem for the relativist thesis is that it seems not to take into account exactly how the prevailing moral norms in a society were established.  If they gained ascendancy over time, shaped by collective experience, then one could perhaps view them as the outcome of an implicit social contract, and in that sense to have some claim to rationality.  But what if they were initially imposed on a society forcibly by conquerors or dictatorial rulers?  Does that make a difference?   It certainly sounds odd to say that a moral statement that once was false can be made true by the establishment of a new religious or political order and the consolidation of its ideas.

Moral relativists are thus under some pressure to explain why they go beyond simple factual statements about what the majority in a society believes, insisting on advancing a philosophical claim about the truth of moral statements.  This is one reason some would give for viewing moral relativism as an instance of a more general relativism that sees the truth of any statement as a function of its coherence with a broader theoretical framework.  Relativists who base their position on a sharp distinction between facts and values must work with two distinct notions of truth: factual claims are made true by correspondence to reality; moral claims are made true by cohering with or being entailed by the surrounding conceptual scheme.  Those who see truth of any kind as ultimately a matter of inter-subjective agreement may be better positioned to avoid this problem.

g. The Relativist Position on Tolerance is Problematic

A good deal of the debate surrounding moral relativism has focused on its claim to exemplify and foster tolerance.  There are at least three lines of criticism against this claim.

(i) Tolerance is not the same as respect.

Showing genuine respect for a culture means taking its beliefs seriously, and that means viewing them as candidates for critical appraisal.  The relativist eschews any evaluation of other cultures’ norms in the name of tolerance; however, this attitude is actually patronizing.  It suggests that the beliefs could not withstand critical scrutiny, or perhaps that they are just not worth appraising.

(ii) Moral relativists inconsistently posit a principle of tolerance as a universal obligation.

Relativists say we should be tolerant of beliefs and practices found in other cultures.  This is a normative claim.  If it applies to everyone, then it is a trans-cultural moral principle, in which case relativism is false.  If, on the other hand, relativism is true, then this principle of tolerance does not express a trans-cultural obligation binding on everyone; it merely expresses the values associated with a particular moral standpoint.

Tolerance is, of course, a central value espoused by modern liberal societies.  But according to the relativist’s own position, members of other societies where tolerance is not viewed so positively have no reason to accept the idea that one ought to be tolerant.  So for other societies, the fact that relativism promotes tolerance is not a point in its favor, and relativists have no business preaching tolerance to them.

It would not be self-contradictory for moral relativists to hold that all moral principles have only a relative validity except for the principle of tolerance, which enjoys a unique status.  But the resulting position would be peculiar.  The relativistic viewpoint would be significantly modified and some account would be owed of why the principle of tolerance alone has universal validity.  For this reason, a more common relativistic response to the criticism is along the lines suggested by David Wong.  Relativists can simply accept that the obligation to be tolerant has only relative validity or scope. It applies to those whose general moral standpoint affirms or entails tolerance as a value; and only these people are likely to be swayed by the argument that relativism promotes tolerance.

(iii) The relativist’s advocacy of tolerance is morally misguided since not everything should be tolerated.

This is, in effect, another version of the charge that moral relativism entails an “anything goes” attitude that countenances obvious wrongs in other societies such as religious persecution or sexual discrimination.  It even requires us to be tolerant of intolerance, at least if it occurs in another culture.

Clearly, this is a problem for anyone, relativist or not, who elevates the principle that we should be tolerant to an absolute, exceptionless rule.  But for relativists who do not do this, the problem will seem less pressing.  Tolerance, they will argue, is one of the values constitutive of their standpoint—a standpoint they share with most other people in modern liberal societies.  From this standpoint, intolerance can and will be criticized, as will other policies and practices, wherever they occur, that seem to cause unhappiness or unnecessarily limit people’s prospects.  The relativistic stance is useful, however, in helping to make us less arrogant about the correctness of our own norms, more sensitive to cultural contexts when looking at how others live, and a little less eager in our willingness to criticize what goes on in other cultures.

The more difficult, practical question concerns not whether we should ever criticize the beliefs and practices found in other cultures, but whether we are ever justified in trying to impose our values on them through diplomatic pressure, economic sanctions, boycotts, or military force.  This question has arisen in relation to such practices as satee in India, persecution of religious or ethnic minorities, female circumcision, and legalized violence against women.  But it is not a problem that only moral relativists have to confront.

5. Conclusion

Over the years moral relativism has attracted a great deal of criticism, and not just from professional philosophers. One reason for this, of course, is that it is widely perceived to be a way of thinking that is on the rise.  Indeed, by the end of the twentieth century it had become a commonplace among teachers of moral philosophy in the US that the default view of morality held by the majority of college students was some form of moral relativism. Another reason for so much trenchant criticism is that a relativistic view of morality is thought by many to have pernicious consequences. For example, in September 2011, Pope Benedict XVI blamed it for the riots that had taken place in Britain a few weeks earlier, arguing that “[w]hen policies do not presume or promote objective values, the resulting moral relativism ... tends instead to produce frustration, despair, selfishness and a disregard for the life and liberty of others” (National Catholic Reporter, Sept. 12, 2011).

However, the attitude labeled “moral relativism” by the pope and others who worry about the moral health of contemporary society is not a well defined or rigorously defended philosophical position. It typically amounts to little more than a skepticism about objective moral truth, often expressed as the idea that beliefs and actions are not right or wrong per se, only right or wrong for someone. Philosophers like Gilbert Harman, David Wong, and Richard Rorty who defend forms of moral relativism seek to articulate and defend philosophically sophisticated alternatives to objectivism.  As they see it, they are not countenancing immorality, injustice, or moral nihilism; rather, they are trying to say something about the nature of moral claims and the justifications given for them.  The main problem they face is to show how the denial of objective moral truth need not entail a subjectivism that drains the rationality out of moral discourse.   Their critics, on the other hand, face the possibly even more challenging task of justifying the claim that there is such a thing as objective moral truth.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Benedict, Ruth.  Patterns of Culture.  New York: Penguin, 1946.
    • Studies three societies to show how beliefs and practices must be understood in the context of the culture in which they occur and its dominant values.
  • Carson, Thomas.  The Status of Morality.  Dordrecht: Reidel, 1984.
    • A sophisticated defense of a version of moral relativism based on an analysis of how, and in what sense, moral judgments can be said to be true or false.
  • Duncker, Karl.  “Ethical Relativity? An Inquiry into the Psychology of Ethics.”  Mind, 48 (1939), pp. 39-57.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. Moral Consciousness and Communicative Action.  Translated by Christian Lenhardt and Shierry Weber Nicholsen.  Cambridge, Mass.: M.I.T. Press, 1990.
    • Argues that in every human society there are certain common norms and values presupposed by social interaction.
  • Harmen, Gilbert.  The Nature of Morality: An Introduction to Ethics.  New York: Oxford University Press, 1977.
    • Presents a version of moral relativism based on an analysis of what it means for someone to have a reason to do something.
  • Harré, Rom, and Krausz, Michael.  Varieties of Relativism. Oxford: Blackwell, 1996.
    • Catalogues the different types of relativism, including moral relativism, along with the main arguments for and against each type.
  • Harrison, Geoffrey.  “Relativism and Tolerance.”  Ethics 86 (2), (1976).pp. 122-135.
  • Herskovits, Melville.  Cultural Relativism: Perspectives in Cultural Pluralism.  New York:  Random House, 1972.
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1983. (First published in 1751.)
  • Krausz, Michael, and Meiland, Jack W. (eds.). Relativism: Cognitive and Moral. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1982.
    • Anthology of important articles on both kinds of relativism.
  • Krausz, Michael(ed.).  Relativism: Interpretation and Confrontation.  Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1989.
    • Extensive collection of articles; somewhat wider in scope than the Krausz-Meiland anthology.
  • Ladd, John(ed.). Ethical Relativism.  Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 1973.
    • Anthology that focuses on the contribution of anthropology to the moral relativism debate.
  • Levi, Neil.  Moral Relativism: A Short Introduction. Oxford: Oneworld, 2002.
    • A very clear study, fairly sympathetic to relativism, which analyzes and appraises many of the central arguments for and against.
  • Lukes, Steven. Moral Relativism. New York: Picador, 2008.
    • A concise introduction that focuses on debates within the social sciences about culture and diversity.
  • Mackie, J. L.  Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong. London: Penguin, 1991.
  • Montaigne, Michel de.  “On Custom” and “On Cannibals,” in The Complete Essays of Montaigne, trans. Donald M. Frame.  Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1958. (First published in 1580.)
  • Moody-Adams, Michele.  Fieldwork in Familiar Places.  Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1997.
  • Moser, Paul K., and Carson, Thomas L.(eds.). Moral Relativism: A Reader. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • Extensive anthology of excerpts from classic texts and contemporary articles by leading participants in the debate about moral relativism.  Includes an extensive bibliography.
  • Nietzsche, Friedrich. Beyond Good and Evil.  Translated by Walter Kaufmann.  New York: Random House, 1966.
  • Nietzsche, Friedrich. On the Genealogy of Morals.  Translated by Walter Kaufmann and R. J. Hollingdale.  New York: Vintage Books, 1968.
    • Contains Nietzsche’s famous distinction between master and slave morality, which arguably constitutes a version of moral relativism.
  • Rorty, Richard. Contingency, irony, and solidarity.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
    • Supports a version of moral relativism that sees no essential difference between factual claims and normative claims.
  • Ruse, Michael.  Taking Darwin Seriously. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 1998.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, Walter.  Moral Skepticism. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006.
  • Sumner, William Graham.  Folkways.  Boston: Ginn and Company, 1906.
    • Classic early version of moral relativism by an anthropologist.
  • Westermarck, Edvard. Ethical Relativity. New York: Littlefield, Adams & Company, 1932.
  • Wong, David B. Natural Moralities: A Defense of Pluralistic Relativism. New York: Oxford University Press, 2006.
    • Argues for a sophisticated form of moral relativism within limits imposed by human nature and the human condition.


Author Information

Emrys Westacott
Alfred University
U. S. A.

Samuel Alexander (1859—1938)

Samuel AlexanderSamuel Alexander is best known for his role in British Emergentism, an early twentieth century movement which uses the notion of emergence to explain the relationship between mind and body. Alexander argues that mind emerges from body, in the sense that mind is dependent upon brain but not reducible to it. Alexander is also variously associated with both of the major competing ideologies of his time: realism and idealism. Because Alexander rejected idealism in favour of realism about the external world, he is sometimes associated with the Cambridge realists Bertrand Russell and G. E. Moore. But, Alexander spent his early career at Oxford – one of the focal points of British idealism – where he worked with many of the British idealists, including F. H. Bradley. Alexander’s mature metaphysical system bears deep affinities to absolute idealism, and draws on ideas from Spinoza and Hegel. Consequently, Alexander is also sometimes associated with British idealism or British Hegelianism.

Alexander’s magnum opus is Space, Time, and Deity (1920), a two volume work in which he develops an original and systematic metaphysics. Alexander is a super-substantivalist because he holds that matter is identical to spacetime. Alexander argues that space and time are the fundamental entities of the universe, and from spacetime emerges all other existents: matter emerges from spacetime, life emerges from matter, mind emerges from life, and deity emerges from mind. In his day, Alexander’s work was generally well received, and it was the subject of many studies. However, Alexander is little known in the 21st century, and his work is neglected.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Biography and Influence
  3. Early Thought and Writings
    1. Hegel and British Hegelianism
    2. Realism and Naturalism
  4. Space, Time and Deity
    1. Overview
    2. The Fundamentality of Spacetime
    3. Qualities and Categories
    4. Emergence and Spacetime
  5. Alexander and Spinoza
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

Samuel Alexander is best known for his role in British Emergentism, an early twentieth century movement which developed the notion of ‘emergence’ to explain how novel properties might emerge from underlying substrata, such as consciousness emerging from brain. Alexander is also variously associated with both of the competing philosophical ideologies of his period: British Hegelianism (sometimes known as British idealism) and British new realism (the movement that later became known as analytic philosophy).

However, in his lifetime, Alexander was well known in British philosophy for his metaphysics, particularly his highly original metaphysical system which takes spacetime to be the ontological foundation of the universe. In his magnum opus Space, Time and Deity Alexander argues that all other existents – including matter, minds and deity – emerge from spacetime in an ontological hierarchy. In addition to endorsing this early expression of ‘super-substantivalism’ (the thesis that spacetime is identical to matter) Alexander was one of the first philosophers to investigate the consequences of understanding space and time as combined into the four-dimensional manifold spacetime.

2. Biography and Influence

Alexander was born on 6 January 1859 in Sydney, Australia, the fourth child of saddler Samuel Alexander and his wife Eliza Sloman. Alexander’s father died of consumption shortly before his birth. Alexander spent his youth being educated at private schools before entering the University of Melbourne, where he gained many distinctions. In 1877 Alexander sailed to England – without having finished his Australian degree – with a view to obtaining a scholarship at the University of Oxford. Luckily, Alexander did indeed obtain a scholarship at Balliol College, and he remained at Oxford for many years. Balliol College was the home of a significant number of British Hegelians: Benjamin Jowett, T. H. Green, R. L. Nettleship and A. C. Bradley. As an undergraduate, Alexander fell under this Hegelian influence in a variety of ways, as evidenced by the early work published during his subsequent eleven year fellowship at Lincoln College (see section 2.1).

In 1893 Alexander accepted a professorship at the University of Manchester, where he taught for over thirty years and became very involved in the life of the city; for example, he strongly supported the women’s suffrage movement. In 1902 his entire family – his mother, an aunt, two brothers and a sister – emigrated from Australia to live with him. The change was apparently a great success. Alexander was appointed President of the Aristotelian Society from 1908-1911 (and again later, from 1936-1937). In 1913 he was made a fellow of the British Academy. Alexander seems to have led a happy academic career. In a speech given after his academic retirement, Alexander said: ‘I owe to the University the long thirty-one years that I was proud and happy to be a professor here, during which I tried to do my part’. For further personal autobiographical information, see John Laird’s memoir of Alexander, included in Alexander’s (1939) Philosophical and Literary Pieces. Laird was Alexander’s friend and literary executer.

In 1915 Alexander was appointed as the Gifford lecturer at the University of Glasgow. He delivered his Gifford lectures in the war years of 1917 and 1918, and these were subsequently published, under the same name, in two volumes as Space, Time, and Deity (1920). The delay between the lectures and the publication is due to the fact that Alexander found their production difficult; Laird writes that Alexander ‘was overwhelmed by a sense of his littleness in comparison with the task to which he was tied’ – the books are ‘metaphysical in the grand manner’. Nonetheless, the books were eventually published, and contain the culmination of Alexander’s work on super-substantivalism and emergence. For the most part the books were well received; Laird describes how his reviewers were in general ‘profoundly and gratefully impressed – if they were seldom convinced’. In his critical two-part book review, C. D. Broad describes how few of the Gifford lectures have been so eagerly waited as Alexander’s, and that his ingenious and original system did not disappoint.  Aside from a few short pieces that supplement these books – such as Alexander’s reply to Broad’s review in “Some Explanations” (1921) and his gloss of Spinoza’s ontology in Spinoza and Time (1921) – Alexander preferred to let the books stand alone. Alexander took real pride in the similarities between his system and that of Spinoza, despite his acknowledgement that his gloss of Spinoza’s system takes Spinoza’s work to an end that Spinoza himself would not have entertained. Laird reports that Alexander would have been very happy to have a reference to Spinoza – Erravit cum Spinoza – engraved on his funeral urn. In his late years, Alexander moved his focus from metaphysics to literary theory and aesthetics, as evidenced by his last book Beauty and other Forms of Value (1933).

Alexander died in Manchester, on 13 September 1938. In the decades following his death several studies explored his work from various vantage points. These include John McCarthy’s Naturalism of Samuel Alexander (1948), Alfred Stiernotte’s God and Space-Time (1954), Betram Brettschneider’s The Philosophy of Samuel Alexander (1964) and Michael Weinstein’s Unity and Variety in the Philosophy of Samuel Alexander (1984). Since then, interest in Alexander’s philosophy has waned.

Some commentators understand Alexander as a new realist, whilst others argue that he is substantially Hegelian. For example, McCarthy (1948) praises Alexander for his naturalism and his realism. In contrast, Brettschneider (1964) accuses Alexander of slipping absolute idealism in by the back door, on the grounds that his metaphysics involves many notions utilised by the idealists, such as coherence and concrete universals: Alexander ‘acts like Bradley and thinks like Bradley, but refuses to acknowledge the prepotency of the idealistic metaphysics in his Space-Time universe’. Alexander is genuinely a product of his generation in that he is caught in between the outgoing tide of Hegelianism and the incoming tide of new realism.

3. Early Thought and Writings

a. Hegel and British Hegelianism

The influence of British Hegelianism can be seen in Alexander’s earliest publications. One of his first published papers, “Hegel’s Conception of Nature” (1886), explores how Hegel’s understanding of nature and organism relates to contemporary science, especially the theory of evolution. In the paper Alexander interprets Hegel’s conception of space to mean that space, not matter, comes first in the logical order of nature. He adds that, for Hegel, ‘Space and Time together... involve each other and combine to produce Motion, the soul of the world, which precipitates matter in its process’ (Alexander, 1886, 503). Whether or not Alexander’s interpretation of Hegel’s conception of space is correct, this piece is important because the interpretation prefigures Alexander’s own later view that spacetime is ontologically fundamental and produces matter through a dynamical process. In other words, Alexander develops and expands a view that he takes to have much in common with Hegel.

Alexander’s first published book, Moral Order and Progress (1889), is evidence not just of Hegel’s influence on his work but also that of some of Britain’s most prominent neo-Hegelians. The book is an expansion of an essay written in 1887, for which Alexander was awarded the Green Moral Philosophy Prize. In the book’s preface, Alexander explains that he is proud to have his work connected – however indirectly – with that of T. H. Green. The book is dedicated to his former tutor, A. C. Bradley, and Alexander describes how D.G. Ritchie read the proofs, R. L. Nettleship and J. S. Haldane gave advice and F. H. Bradley – the brother of Alexander’s former tutor – went through the original essay. Alexander remained in contact with both A. C. Bradley and F. H. Bradley throughout his life. This first book attempts to show that there is at least a partial convergence between idealist ethics – of the kind advanced by Green – and evolutionary ethics. Alexander argues that both kinds of ethics recognises that there is a proportion, or relationship, between the individual and his society which is best expressed organically. Hegelian ideas permeated Alexander’s philosophy throughout his life.

b. Realism and Naturalism


In 1903 came the dual attacks on idealism from the British ‘new realists’ Russell and Moore: Russell’s Principles of Mathematics (1903) attacks the idealistic monistic doctrine of internal relations, while Moore’s “Refutation of Idealism” (1903) attacks (at least one version of) idealism. Alexander joined the rejection of idealism in print not least with his “Ptolemaic and Copernican views of the place of mind in the universe” (1909) where he compares idealism’s claim that mind is the centre of the universe to Ptolemaic geocentricism, and argues in favour of a realist revolution analogous to Copernican heliocentricism. Alexander describes idealism as the doctrine that in some sense the world is the contents of our consciousness, that things are dependent on the mind not only for being known but for their existence. Alexander rejects idealism on the grounds that it does not fit with experience. He argues that the simplest kind of apprehension of external things, such as the perception of a house or tree, contains in relation to one another two separate things – the tree and the act of perception – such that the tree is not yourself, nor dependent on yourself. Having rejected the Ptolemaic view which places mind at the centre of the universe, he argues in favour of the Copernican view, which holds that minds are merely special parts of a much larger universe.

Alexander expands on his rejection of idealism in a number of further pieces, the most important of which is “The Basis of Realism” (1914). The basic message remains the same – the experience of the relation of knower to known declares that the mind and its object are two separate existences connected together by the relation of togetherness or compresence – and this is not an argument but rather a fact of experience. However, this paper is particularly important because in it Alexander’s rejection of idealism comes paired with his acceptance of realism, the starting point of which is defined as the claim that the empirical characters of various kinds of existences is the subject-matter of the special sciences. Alexander considers himself a naturalist as well as a realist, in the sense that the physical aspect of things is pervasive.

“The Basis of Realism” is one paper of a cluster that Alexander published in a short period – others include “The Method of Metaphysics; and the Categories” (1912) and “On Relations, and in Particular the Cognitive Relation” (1912) – that explore the ideas which later appear in his magnum opus. Two of the ideas explored here are of particular importance. The first is Alexander’s repeated assertion of the reality of space and time. ‘Space and Time are, for idealism, appearances and in some respects the lowest degree of reality... But for realism the question arises whether these may not be at the foundation of all reality, and whether it may not be they which hold the world together’. This comment is interesting because although many of the British idealists – most famously, F. H. Bradley and J. M. E. McTaggart – did deny the reality of space and time, Alexander himself interpreted the idealist Hegel as placing them foremost in his ontology. The second is the idea that reality is organised into a hierarchy of layers, each of which emerges from the one before. Alexander argues that mind, or consciousness, is a new quality of existence, and that which has mind is a new kind of creature, existing at a higher level than physical or even living things.

4. Space, Time and Deity

a. Overview

In Space, Time, and Deity Alexander creates a metaphysical system with spacetime at its foundation, and deity as its culmination. He took the role of spacetime to be central. ‘It is not, I believe, too much to say that all the vital problems of philosophy depend for their solution on the solution of the problem what Space and Time are’. Alexander’s method is unusual for a philosopher in that he does not proceed by argument so much as by description: rather than arguing for his system, he simply points out how intuitive it is and how well it fits the facts of our experience. (In fact, Alexander goes so far as to claim that he dislikes argument.)

Alexander’s system can be seen to proceed via three main steps. Firstly, he describes how spacetime is real, and argues that it is identical to matter. Secondly, he describes how the nature of spacetime gives rise to two kinds of characters: qualities and categories. Lastly, he describes how mind emerges from matter and applies this idea to the universe as a whole to produce a hierarchy of existence in which each layer emerges from the next: spacetime leads to matter, matter leads to mind, mind leads to deity. The following sections will examine each step in turn.

b. The Fundamentality of Spacetime

Alexander’s arguments regarding the fundamentality of spacetime can be found in the first volume of Space, Time & Deity. Alexander begins by arguing that spacetime is real. His central argument for this claim is based on the Platonic claim that we can apprehend, or intuit, space and time directly. Alexander argues that while intuition is different from reason, the value of intuition should not be depreciated. The idea is that, whilst we cannot perceive space or time through our senses, we intuit their existence via their contents.

Having established the reality of space and time, Alexander goes on to investigate their nature. The nature of space has long been a topic of philosophical enquiry, and from the seventeenth century there has been debate as to whether space is best described by relationism or substantivalism. Relationism holds that space is not an entity or substance of any kind – it would not be included in any list of the universe’s ingredients – it merely comprises the network of spatial relations that hold between material objects. In contrast, substantivalism holds that space is an entity or substance of some kind. Although historically this debate concerned space rather than spacetime, by the early twentieth century – motivated by the work of physicists such as Minkowski and Einstein, and philosophers such as Bergson – the debate was extended to apply to time as well as space. As Alexander puts it, the early twentieth century began to ‘Take Time Seriously’. In his discussion, Alexander takes himself to be choosing between relationism and substantivalism. He argues that while relationism is a legitimate view, it does not represent our direct, intuitional apprehension or experience of space or time. Having rejected relationism, Alexander turns to substantivalism.

The substantivalist can take one of two stances on the status of material (or immaterial) objects. Dualistic substantivalism holds that space and material objects coexist as distinct kinds of substances. Super-substantivalism holds that space is the only kind of substance, and matter is identical to it. Alexander assumes that, given the nature of spacetime as he understands it, super-substantivalism follows automatically. This is because, for Alexander, it is the very nature of spacetime to give rise to material objects. This is because spacetime is identified with ‘Motion’, and it is Motion which produces material objects. This identification is one of Alexander’s most fundamental claims, and unfortunately it is also one of the most obscure.

The identification has its roots in the fact that Alexander conceives of space and time not as independent substances but rather as interdependent ones. He gives us two arguments for this. Firstly, there is the argument from physics: physicists such as Minkowski and Einstein claim that space and time should now be considered as the four dimensional manifold spacetime. Secondly, there is Alexander’s difficult (and heavily criticised – see Broad) a priori argument. Essentially, Alexander argues that it is space which lends time continuity and variety: if time existed independently of space, time would consist of perishing instants, which would lack continuity and succession. Similarly, Alexander argues that it is time which gives space distinct parts: without time, space would consist of a sheer homogeneous blank without distinct parts. It is this second argument which leads Alexander to claim that time is the source of movement, and hence the source of motion. As time moves through space, it produces matter – variegated, continuous complexes of spacetime – in its process. ‘Space-Time is a system of motions, and we might call Space-Time by the name of Motion’.

Later in his system, Alexander describes how there is a ‘nisus’ in spacetime – a striving force – which carries its creatures upwards through the various levels of existence to the highest level of deity. Both spacetime and the nisus are creative: time introduces a restlessness into space that culminates in motion, and the nisus drives spacetime to produce ever newer forms of existence. It is not entirely clear what the relationship between spacetime and the nisus is supposed to be; there are two possible readings of Alexander on this issue. On the first reading, the nisus is the motion of spacetime. On the second reading, the nisus is an extra ingredient added to spacetime, which acts as a kind of organisational principle on the complexes of motion that emerge from spacetime. For more on this, see Emmet (1950).

Alexander’s identification of spacetime with ‘a single vast entity Motion’, along with his introduction of a nisus, provides the foundation for his entire ontology, for it is the many individual motions within Motion that constitute all other existents, from material objects to minds. And this is why Alexander is a super-substantivalist, rather than a dualistic substantivalist: it is the very nature of spacetime to produce the motions that are all other existents, and as such there is no need to even consider postulating another substance (such as matter, or mind) distinct from spacetime to explain their existence.

c. Qualities and Categories

For Alexander, existing things are continuously connected groupings of motions, connected through spacetime. These things, or motions, have characters, some of which are variable and some of which are pervasive. For example, the character of an apple is always substantial but it changes from red to brown. Pervasive characters are ‘categories’, and they apply in some form to all existents, from material objects to minds. In contrast, variable characters are ‘qualities’ – such as colour, shape or consciousness – that existents can have or not have.

The categories include identity, substance, universality, order, diversity, magnitude and number. The fact that these categories apply to all things is no coincidence: the categories are the fundamental properties of spacetime. For example, the categories of identity, diversity and existence arise out of the intrinsic nature of spacetime ‘as a continuum of parts’ which are themselves spaces and times. All things that exist are subject to the category of existence because they occupy spacetime, and that is what it is to exist. Similarly, all things that exist are self-identical and diverse from all other things because, as we saw above, time gives space distinct parts and vice versa. Existence, identity and diversity are but a few of the categories – there are many more. Two categories deserve a special mention. The first is that of substance, which for Alexander is any ‘contour of space’. For Alexander, all existents are substances – even a simple motion in a straight line – for all existents are subject to the categories. The second is whole and parts. Just as time and space break up into wholes of parts, so individual wholes within spacetime break up into parts. Alexander concludes that everything exhibits categorical features.

d. Emergence and Spacetime

Emergence is the notion that novel properties ‘emerge’ out of more fundamental properties or entities. In contemporary philosophy of mind, the notion is sometimes used to explain how consciousness emerges from brain. In addition to Alexander, emergentism has its primary roots in the work of early twentieth century British philosophers C. Lloyd Morgan and C. D. Broad. Part of the motivation underlying emergentism in the philosophy of mind is the desire to naturalise the mind yet acknowledge its novel nature. Alexander’s emergentist conception of the mind directly informs his super-substantivalism. 

Alexander explicitly acknowledges his intellectual debt to Morgan for his emergent understanding of mind, explaining that he has even chosen the term ‘emergent’ after the example of Morgan. Morgan explains that emergence can be used to explain the ‘genuinely new’ things that sometimes occur in the process of Darwinian evolution. Alexander adapts this account for his own ends, arguing that experience leads us to connect our mental processes with our body, to locate our mental processes in the same places and times as certain neural processes. Alexander explains the correlation between mind and brain in virtue of the fact ‘they are not two but one’: conscious processes are neural processes. The idea is that once neural processes reach a certain level of development, the quality of mentality or consciousness is achieved. This quality of mental process is ‘something new, a fresh creation’, that emerges out of matter. Alexander is careful to emphasise that, as on Morgan’s conception, his conception of mind and brain is not a parallelism of two distinct entities but instead a species of identity doctrine: the mental process and its neural process are one and the same existence, not two existences. O’Connor and Wong argue that Alexander’s characterisation of emergentism – which they paraphrase as the claim that ‘Emergent qualities are novel qualities that supervene on a distinctive kind of physico-chemical process’ – is very close in detail to a standard form of non-reductive physicalism in contemporary philosophy of mind, wherein mind is identical but not reducible to the brain (O’Connor & Wong, 2009, 8).

Alexander conceives of nature as layered into a hierarchy of existents, ascending in complexity. For Alexander, it is not just the case that mind emerges from matter, matter also emerges from spacetime. His system can be illustrated as follows:

Levels of being Structure Quality
Space and time Motion
Matter Individual complexes of motion Corporeality
Organisms Physio-chemical processes Life
Man Body Consciousness
God The whole world Deity

Alexander’s strategy to realise this hierarchy is simple. He takes the idea of emergence as it applies to the mind and brain, and applies it to space and time. Just as mind and body are ‘indissoluble and identical’, so are space and time. The only way in which the analogy fails to hold is that our minds are a new quality which emerge from our bodies, whereas time is not a new quality that emerges from space. ‘Space and Time only exists with the existence of the other, and their relation is such as we might imagine that of mind and brain to be if neuro-mental processes could subsist by themselves without their presuppositions in a larger vital and hence in a physic-chemical world of things’. In connection to this thesis, Alexander famously claims that ‘Time is the mind of Space’. This does not mean that time is conscious in any way, it merely means that time performs the same function for space as mind does for the body. This function is that time allows new qualities (such as colour or consciousness) to emerge because time is the source of motion, and it is individual motions which have qualities. The fundamental level of nature is spacetime or motion, from which proceeds the individual motions which take on the emergent qualities of matter, life and mind. An important difficulty concerning Alexander’s application of mind-body emergence to the universe as a whole is raised by Emmet (1950). Emmet points out that when giving a general worldview in terms of an analogy drawn from a special field – in this case the psycho-physical relation –  it is surely necessary that the initial relation from which the analogy is drawn should itself be clearly understood. This particular relation is not at all clear – the relation between the body and mind is one of the most difficult problems of philosophy – and as such Emmet worries that Alexander’s whole project is an attempt to explain an obscurity using a further obscurity.

Alexander’s emergentism explains how it is that spacetime gives rise to matter, mind and life. All that is left on his system is to explain how spacetime gives rise to deity. Alexander offers us a metaphysical definition of God, whereby God is that which possesses ‘deity or the divine quality’. He then sets out to show us that, whilst mind or consciousness is the highest quality that we know of in the universe, deity is even higher. The nisus in spacetime will not cease with mind, it will bring its creatures forward to some higher level of existence. Deity has not yet emerged in the universe – ‘deity is not actual but ideal’ – but, as Alexander paraphrases Leibniz, the world is big with it. Alexander is careful to point out that this ideal emergent deity is distinct from spacetime itself, arguing that while spacetime can be intuited it cannot be worshiped. Alexander’s notion of deity is somewhat obscure. For example, it is not clear whether deity should emerge from one particular human consciousness, or from many.

5. Alexander and Spinoza

Whilst producing the metaphysical system expressed in Space, Time and Deity, Alexander was apparently unaware of the similarities between his system and that of Spinoza. His inspirations  were Plato and Kant, and Alexander only belatedly realised the import of Spinoza’s doctrines. However, once Alexander realised the resemblance, he took it very seriously, citing Hegel’s saying ‘that to be a philosopher a man must first be a Spinozaist’. Alexander produced two pieces exploring the connections between his system and that of Spinoza – Spinoza and Time (1921a) and “Lessons from Spinoza” (1928) – and he goes so far as to express his system as a ‘gloss’ of Spinoza. Alexander was impressed not just by Spinoza’s metaphysics but also by the way that Spinoza combined naturalism with a profound sense of religion and value. This is, of course, exactly the combination that Alexander had tried to produce himself.

In describing Alexander’s gloss of Spinoza, we will focus on Alexander’s interpretation of Spinoza (for alternative interpretations, see the main IEP article “Spinoza”). As described above (section 3.2) the seventeenth century philosophers took space seriously but they neglected time; Alexander aims to reinvent Spinoza’s system in light of his contemporary resolve to take time seriously. Alexander sets out to investigate the difference it would make to Spinoza’s philosophy if we were to assign to time a position not allowed to it by Spinoza himself, but suggested by the difficulties – and even obscurities – in it. Alexander understands Spinoza the following way. Spinoza holds that just one substance exists, which does not depend on anything else for its existence or explanation: everything that exists in nature is in God and are modifications of him. God can be apprehended through two attributes, thought and extension, which are but two forms of one and the same reality. Already the similarities between Alexander and Spinoza’s systems are emerging: both philosophers hold that there is one substance which is the ontological ground of the universe as a whole, and that this single substance is the ground of both matter and mind.

Alexander describes Spinoza’s conception of space and time as follows. Spinoza understands spatial extension as an attribute of God. When we speak of individual lengths or spaces we are confused – we are not dealing with reality, except of the imagination – because space (or extension) is really a partless God under a certain attribute. Individual spaces are contrasted with this divine attribute of space. Between God as perceived under the attribute of extension, and the finite extended modes which are spatial bodies, there are infinite modes – motion and rest – which ‘break the fall from Heaven to Earth’. It is these modes which break up the unity of God’s extension into a multiplicity, in the same way that time breaks up Alexander’s space into parts. Of course, Spinoza denies that God actually has parts, and Alexander argues that is one of the weaknesses of Spinoza’s system that the parts are submerged within the whole rather than conspiring in semi-independence towards it. This weakness aside, Alexander sets out to understand how the infinite modes break up the unity of God. He argues that Spinoza takes it as axiomatic that bodies are all either in motion or at rest –  in other words, bodies are complexes of motions – and that Spinoza believes this because extension expresses God’s essence, and as such is alive. Alexander finds this explanation for why bodies are axiomatically in motion or at rest unsatisfactory because life implies change, and change implies time, yet time is excluded from the nature of God who is merely timeless. As Alexander explains, Spinoza understands time very differently to space. For Spinoza, durations of time, even conceived of parts of an indefinite duration, are not real realities. Time (or duration) is not an attribute of God so individual times cannot be contrasted with it in the way that space as an attribute of God is contrasted with individual spaces.

Alexander aims to describe Spinoza’s system as it would be if Spinoza did accept time as an attribute of God, arguing that this would solve Spinoza’s unsatisfactory explanation of motion. In this ‘gloss’ of Spinoza, God’s extension should not be merely understood as spatial, but as spatio-temporal. In Alexander’s gloss, the ultimate reality is full of time, it is the theatre of constant change, such that reality is spacetime or motion itself. Alexander believes that this addition solves another problem in Spinoza, namely the apparent gulf between the divine substance and its modes: ‘there is now no ditch to jump between the ultimate ground of things and things in themselves; for things are... but complexes of motion and made of the stuff which the ultimate or a priori reality is’. Just as Alexander allows that individual existing things are not engulfed, but rather conserved, in his single substance, so Spinoza can allow the same. Just as spacetime is motion on Alexander’s system, and this creates novel substances such as matter and minds, so God is a ceaseless creator in Spinoza’s system.

A consequence of Alexander’s gloss is that the hierarchy of modes described in Spinoza’s system becomes a temporal, as well as a logical series. The highest level of this series that we are aware of is that of thinking things, which entails that thought is no longer an attribute of God but rather a quality of the highest level of existents. Time has displaced thought in Spinoza’s scheme. Furthermore, as the two attributes we have been discussing – space and time – can do everything that is needed to do on Spinoza’s scheme, there is no need to postulate any further attributes of God, known or otherwise. ‘Space and Time are seen to exhaust the attributes of reality’ (Alexander, 1921a). A further – and much more radical – consequence of Alexander’s gloss is that spacetime can no longer be identified with, or understood as an attribute, of God. This is because, as Alexander points out in his own system, spacetime cannot be an object of worship. In order to place deity within his gloss, Alexander looks to Spinoza’s conatus doctrine, according to which everything strives to persist in its being. Alexander argues that Spinoza understood the notion of conatus as a metaphysical conception, rather than a biological one, and consequently it is difficult to understand. This is because, for Alexander, the conatus doctrine is best illustrated in organic beings – where the plant or animal maintains its single individuality of being, abandoning it only to external violence or internal decay – although it can be found in inanimate stones or atoms as well: an atom persists in its being so far as the motions of its planetary system of electrons, moving round their central nucleus, are conserved. On Alexander’s gloss, the roots of the conatus doctrine are to be found in the restlessness of spacetime, which ‘falls of itself’ into the complexes of motion which are bodies; in turn these forms evolve into new orders of beings with new characters and their own conatus to persevere in their type. In accordance with his own system, Alexander gives this conatus a new name – ‘nisus’ – and it is this biological striving that we observe in organic bodies and atoms. This nisus also gives rise to a level of existence higher than minds, such that God becomes the world as a whole with a nisus towards deity.

In typically poetical style, Alexander describes the conclusion of his gloss of Spinoza as follows:

[If] the reality in its barest character is Space-Time, the face of the whole universe is the totality of all those configurations into which Space-Time falls through its inherent character of timefulness or restlessness... [the] stuff of reality is not stagnant, its soul’s wings are never furled, and in virtue of this unceasing movement it strikes out fresh complexes of movements, all created things (Alexander, 1921a).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Alexander, Samuel (1886) “Hegel's Conception of Nature”. Mind Vol. 11, pp. 495-523.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1909)“Ptolemaic and Copernican views of the place of Mind in the Universe”. The Hibbert Journal Vol. VIII.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1912) “The Method of Metaphysics, and the Categories”. Mind Vol. 21, 1-20
  • Alexander, Samuel (1912) “On Relations; and in particular the Cognitive Relations”. Mind Vol. 21, 305-328.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1914)“The Basis of Realism”. Proceedings of the British Academy Vol. V, 279-314
  • Alexander, Samuel (1920i) Space, Time and Deity. Macmillan & Co Ltd: London.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1920ii) Space, Time and Deity. Macmillan & Co Ltd: London.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1921a) Spinoza and Time. Unwin Brothers, Ltd: GB.Alexander, Samuel (1921b) “Some Explanations”. Mind Vol. 30, pp. 409-428.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1928) “Lessons from Spinoza”. Chronicon Spinozanum Vol. 5, 14-29.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1939) Philosophical and Literary Pieces. Edited by John Laird. Macmillan & Co: Great Britain.
    • [Includes a memoir of Alexander by Laird]

b. Secondary Sources

  • Brettschneider, Betram (1964).The Philosophy of Samuel Alexander. Humanities Press: USA.
  • Broad, C. D. (1921). “Professor Alexander’s Gifford Lectures” [two parts] Mind Vol. 30.
    • [Critically discusses particular aspects of Alexander’s Space, Time & Deity, such as Alexander’s identification of spacetime and motion]
  • Emmet, Dorothy (1950). “Time is the mind of space”, Philosophy Vol. 25, pp. 225-234.
    • [Explains Alexander’s application of mind-body emergence to the universe as a whole]
  • Leighton, Joseph (1922). Man and the Cosmos. D. Appleton & Company: USA.
    • [Contains a limited summary of Alexander’s super-substantivalism]
  • McCarthy, John (1948). The Naturalism of Samuel Alexander. Macmillan & Co, Ltd: USA.
  • Murphy, Arthur E. (1927) “Alexander's Metaphysic of Space-Time” [multiple parts]. The Monist, Vol, 38.
    • [Tackles particular issues in Space, Time & Deity such as Alexander’s theory of categories]
  • O’Connor, Timothy & Wong, Hung Yu (2009). “Emergent Properties” in Stanford Encyclopaedia of Philosophy.
    • [Discusses the history of British emergentism, including Alexander’s contribution]
  • Stiernotte, Alfred (1954). God and Space-Time. Philosophy Library: USA.
    • [Study of Alexander’s philosophy; contains detailed discussion of pantheism]
  • Thomas, Emily (2013). "Space, Time, and Samuel Alexander". British Journal for the History of Philosophy 21: 549-569.
  • Weinstein, Michael (1984). Unity and Variety in the Philosophy of Samuel Alexander. Purdue University Press: USA.


Author Information

Emily Thomas
Cambridge University
United Kingdom


Concepts of property are used to describe the legal and ethical entitlements that particular people or groups have to use to manage particular resources. Beyond that most general definition of 'property' however, philosophical controversy reigns.

Political and legal philosophers disagree on what types of entitlements are essential elements of property, and on the shape and nature of the resultant property entitlements. Indeed, philosophers even disagree on whether it makes sense to talk, in abstraction from a specific legal context, of concepts of property at all. These theoretical controversies are mirrored in practice and law. Cases are determined and conflicts are resolved – or fomented, as the case may be – by the different ideas of property that claimants, judges, legislators and ordinary people recognise and deploy. These controversies are compounded when property concepts are used in application not only to the obvious cases of land and chattels (that is, movable items of property like chairs and cars), but to airspace, airwaves, inventions, information, corporate stock, reputations, fishing rights, brand names, labour, works of art and literature, and more.

Over the last century of political and legal thought, there have been two major – and very different –property-concepts: Bundle Theory and Full Liberal Ownership. Bundle Theory holds that property is a disparate ‘bundle’ of legal entitlements, or ‘sticks’ as they are metaphorically termed. What property a person holds in any given case is determined by the specific entitlements granted by the law to that person. According to Bundle Theory there is no prior idea of property that the law reflects, or that guides the adjudication of cases. The central reason supporting Bundle Theory is the dizzying diversity of property entitlements in law: applying to myriad sorts of resources, regulated in innumerable ways, subject to different sorts of taxation and differing across jurisdictions.

Other theorists, however, have argued that despite the complexity of certain cases of property in law, the idea of property carries genuine content across many contexts and jurisdictions – especially in application to land and chattels. Far from having no substance, the idea of Full Liberal Ownership gave property a detailed and comprehensive meaning: property includes the full gamut of rights to: (a) use the owned resource, (b) exclude others from entering it, and, (c)alienate it (that is, to sell it to someone else).

Yet if Bundle Theory can be faulted as being too nebulous to be correct, some property theorists have argued that Full Liberal Ownership falls into the opposite error, and is too simple and stringent to explain the lived detail of property entitlements. Rejecting both these theories, these theorists have developed diverging accounts of property, arguing that one feature or other – exclusion, use, power, immunity or remedy – is the essential hallmark of property.

This article surveys the major types of contemporary property theories, and the philosophical arguments offered in support of them. The nature of such property concepts carries consequences for the ethical justifications of various property regimes. Several of the more important consequences will be noted in this article, but not pursued in any detail. Readers interested in ethical justifications for property rights should consult the IEP article The Right to Private Property.

Table of Contents

  1. Preliminaries
  2. Bundle Theory
  3. Full Liberal Ownership
  4. The General Idea of Private Property: The Integrated Theory
  5. Exclusion: Trespass-Based Theories
  6. Use: Harm-Based Theories
    1. Overlapping Property: Common and Resource Property Rights
  7. Power-Based Theories: The Question of Alienation
  8. Immunity-Based Theories
  9. Remedy-Based Theories
  10. Examples of Cross-Cutting Theories
    1. Radin and Property for Personhood
    2. Katz and Ownership as Agenda-Setting
  11. Socialist and Egalitarian Property
  12. References and Further Reading

1. Preliminaries

With his characteristic shrewdness, Nietzsche once observed that it is hard to define concepts that have a history. Whatever else may be said of it, property has a history; forms of private property in land date back at least ten millennia, and private property in chattels (movable objects of property like tools and clothes) was present in the Stone Age. With Nietzsche’s point in mind, then, three general remarks on property’s conceptual ambiguities are worth making.

First, the term ‘property’ may refer to the proprietorial entitlements of an owner (Bob has property in that car) or it may refer to the thing that is owned itself (That car is Bob’s property). Lawyers and philosophers tend to be wary of the latter use, primarily because it can distract attention from the significance of the entitlements involved. That is, if we speak about Bob’s car as being his property, then we might be inclined to think that property is all about Bob’s relation to his car, rather than being about the duties everyone owes Bob with respect to his car. If we say that Bob has property in his car, then it is a little clearer that property is about legal and ethical entitlements, and not merely about a physical thing.  That said however, using ‘property’ to refer only to entitlements and not to things carries the danger of forgetting that ordinary people and sometimes even lawmakers may be using the term in its second application (Wenar 1997). With this in mind, this article will use the term in both its meanings; context should at any point make clear which is intended.

Second, property comes in at least three different basic forms: private, collective and common. Private property grants entitlements to a resource to particular individuals, collective property vests them in the state, and common property enfranchises all members of a community. Most contemporary debate on the nature of property surrounds the concept of private property, and this will be the focus of the article. Reflecting this, the term ‘property’ typically will stand for private property, except in the specific sections dealing with common property and collective property (§ 6.1 and §11). Reference to one of these three types of property is often used to characterise types of economic and political regimes. For instance, liberalism may be characterised by private property, socialism by collective property, and certain forms of anarchism and communitarianism by the use of common property. However, it is important to be aware that such characterisations are made on the basis of the predominant form of property in the regime, as no regime relies exclusively on just one form of property. Certain resources seem to be more amenable to one type of property entitlement than another: air as common property, toothbrushes as private property, and artillery as collective property, for example.

Third, actual property entitlements – in law and custom alike – tend to be highly complex, so caution is advisable when philosophical (armchair) theories of property are used to characterise actual property entitlements. The effort to categorize and clarify can distort important features of property that lie within its complexities.

2. Bundle Theory

Bundle Theory is not so much a property-concept as it is the idea that ‘property’ is not really a proper concept at all. Bundle Theory states that there is no pre-existing, well-defined and integrated concept of property that guides – or should guide – our understanding of property-entitlements, or the creation or interpretation of property-entitlements in law. Instead, the law grants specific entitlements of people to things. The property that a person holds in any given instance is simply the sum total of the particular entitlements the law grants to her in that situation. These particular entitlements are metaphorically termed ‘sticks’, and the property that a person holds is thus the particular bundle of sticks the law grants to them in the given instance. Changes to law can alter property entitlements by adding or removing particular sticks from the bundle. Also, several people may have property-entitlements in one resource, as the sticks are spread amongst them, each person with his own bundle. In such cases, Bundle Theory says, it is meaningless to try to determine who the real owner is; each person simply has the entitlements the law grants to them.

There are three main arguments for Bundle Theory. The first argument is conceptual and dates back to Wesley Hohfeld’s path-breaking analysis of rights. Hohfeld (1913) argued that entitlements in law could be broken down into their constituent parts – the basic building-blocks of which more complex legal entitlements are constructed. He termed these basic entitlements ‘jural relations’. In all, Hohfeld described eight jural relations, four of which are important for our purposes here:

Liberty/Privilege: Person A has a liberty to do X with respect to another person B when A has no duty to B not to do X. For example, in an ordinary case Annie will have a liberty (with respect to some other beach-goer Bob) to swim at a public beach if she is not under any duty to Bob not to swim at the beach.

Claim-right: Person A has a claim on another person B to do X when B is under a duty owed to A to perform X. For instance, Annie has a claim-right that Bob not hit her – a claim that correlates with Bob’s duty to refrain from hitting Annie.

Power: Person A has a power over person B with respect to X when A can alter B’s liberties and claim-rights with respect to X. For instance, when Annie alters Bob’s liberties by waiving her claim-right that he not kiss her, she exercises her power to dissolve Bob’s prior duty and so to grant him a liberty. Promising, waiving and selling are all examples of using powers because they all involve the agent in question altering in some way the duties of other people.

Immunity: Person A has an immunity against a person B with respect to X if B cannot alter A’s claims or liberties with respect to X. For instance, if Annie has an immunity against Bob with respect to her freedom of association, then Bob cannot impose new duties on her to refrain from associating (with Charles, say).

Powers and immunities are sometimes called ‘second-order’ jural relations, because they modify or protect first-order jural relations like liberties and claims-rights. For example, when Annie waives (that is, gives up or relinquishes) Bob’s duties not to kiss her, she uses a second-order jural relation (a power) to create in Bob a first-order jural relation (a liberty). As Hohfeld argued, any given right may be broken down into these common denominators – these liberties, claims, immunities and powers. In particular, upon analysis, property may be so divided. Property usually contains some liberties (e.g. to use and possess), some claim-rights (e.g. that others not trespass), some immunities (e.g. that others cannot simply dissolve their duties not to trespass) and some powers (e.g. to sell the owned object). Hohfeld’s analysis demonstrated that property was not as simple an idea as it might first appear. Contrary to popular opinion, property was not a relationship with a thing, but a myriad of jural relations with an indefinite number of other people with respect to a thing. It was not itself a simple entitlement, but rather a consolidated entitlement made up of more simple constituents.

Hohfeld’s analysis did not require adopting the Bundle Theory thesis that there was no integrity or determinate content to the concept of property. One could, as many have since done, hold that property was a specific group of certain sorts of Hohfeldian jural relations. However, Hohfeld’s system laid the conceptual groundwork for Bundle Theory’s stance. Once property could be conceptually dissected into its constituent parts, the door was open for the disintegration of the concept itself. The positive reason for performing such disintegration was supplied by the second argument for Bundle Theory: the complexity of actual proprietorial entitlements in law.

At least by the arrival of the twentieth century, if not much earlier, property entitlements had become enormously complex. Property entitlements were applied to myriad different entities: to airspace, airwaves, inventions, information, fugacious resources (flowing resources like water and oil), riparian land (land bordering rivers), fisheries, wild animals, broadcast rights, mining rights, brand names, labour, works of art and literature, corporate stock, options, reputations, and so on and on. It was difficult to believe that the same cluster of Hohfeldian jural relations were enjoyed by holders of property over all these diverse resources. Furthermore, all of these sorts of property were subject to a wide variety of regulation and taxation measures, all of which might change from country to country, if not state to state. Worse still, many types of property had multiple persons with separate proprietorial entitlements in them; trusts, easements, and common property entitlements all allowed many people to have property in the one resource. While there may have been sense in using a determinate, integrated idea of property in the eighteenth century, it was argued, such a simplistic notion was outmoded (Grey 1980). Faced with the breathtaking variety of existing proprietorial entitlements, the sensible response was to abandon talk of ‘property’ altogether and refer directly to the specific Hohfeldian jural relations – the particular bundle of sticks – held by a given person in a given instance.

The third argument for Bundle Theory’s proposed disintegration of property is an explicitly normative one: that is, it derives from political and ethical theory. Those advocating an integrated idea of property tended to be drawn toward a very strong notion of property: Full Liberal Ownership (see §3 below). This concept of property appeared to leave precious little space for taxation or rates, and so seemed to present a potentially powerful obstacle to the usual schemes for funding basic state institutions, developing public goods, or alleviating poverty. Similarly, Full Liberal Ownership conflicted with state regulation of property, and so opposed environmental limitations on the use of land. With such concerns in mind, some property theorists concluded that any defensible proprietorial entitlements must be fashioned in accord with social justice and environmental commitments, rather than determined by a prior declaration of the essential nature of property (Singer 2000; Freyfogle 2003). Property entitlements are a product of policy and legislation, it was argued, not a conceptual or normative force guiding it. If this is right, then Bundle Theory is a more accurate depiction of the proper nature of property.

For conceptual, descriptive and normative reasons, then, Bundle Theory aimed to disintegrate the concept of property. In its thinking, the state should decide which entitlements to confer on an individual in any given case; that bundle of sticks thereafter constitutes the property that individual holds. There is no prior concept of property determining its bounds.

3. Full Liberal Ownership

If Bundle Theorists had expected the idea of property to fall into disuse however, they were mistaken; the idea of property continued to be invoked in lay, legal and theoretical discourse. Indeed, ordinary people seemed to be able to use their rough-and-ready ideas of property to workably navigate their way through the complex legal world around them. With such considerations as these in mind, philosophers and legal commentators increasingly began to question Bundle Theory’s disintegration of the concept. While the complexity and flexibility of property in some exotic applications could not be questioned, in other more familiar applications it appeared to have an adequate consistency. This was particularly true with respect to chattels like umbrellas, toothbrushes and cars. Far from having no content, it was observed, property entitlements to such objects displayed a profound homogeneity across jurisdictions and political regimes.

Emerging out of this literature, but with countless historical forebears, was a comprehensive concept of property: Full Liberal Ownership. The ringing tones of legal theorist William Blackstone in his 1776 Commentaries on the Laws of England are often used to encapsulate Full Liberal Ownership. In the opening lines of the second book Blackstone declares property to be:

that sole and despotic dominion which one man claims and exercises over the external things of the world, in total exclusion of the right of any other individual in the universe.

Less poetically, but rather more informatively, in 1961 the legal scholar A. M. Honoré set down what he viewed as the eleven ‘standard incidents’ of ownership:

  1. The right to possess: to have exclusive physical control of a thing;
  2. The right to use: to have an exclusive and open-ended capacity to personally use the thing;
  3. The right to manage: to be able to decide who is allowed to use the thing and how they may do so;
  4. The right to the income: to the fruits, rents and profits arising from one’s possession, use and management of the thing;
  5. The right to the capital: to consume, waste or destroy the thing, or parts of it;
  6. The right to security: to have immunity from others being able to take ownership of (expropriating) the thing;
  7. The incident of transmissibility: to transfer the entitlements of ownership to another person (that is, to alienate or sell the thing);
  8. The incident of absence of term: to be entitled to the endurance of the entitlement over time;
  9. The prohibition on harmful use: requiring that the thing may not be used in ways that cause harm to others;
  10. Liability to execution: allowing that the ownership of the thing may be dissolved or transferred in case of debt or insolvency; and,
  11. Residuary character: ensuring that after everyone else’s entitlements to the thing finish (when a lease runs out, for example), the ownership returns to vest in the owner.

With one modification, this list conveys the now popular idea of Full Liberal Ownership. The modification is the rejection by later property theorists of Incident Nine, the prohibition on harmful use. While it is of course agreed that an owner may not use her property in ways that harm others, most theorists see this constraint as a reflection of a prior and ongoing duty all people have not to harm others, and so as not a feature of property per se.

Honoré’s comprehensive listing of these incidents does not in itself confute Bundle Theory. Indeed, as it turned out, Honoré’s list proved a helpful resource for Bundle Theorists; it usefully described the types of sticks that may or may not be present in a proprietor’s bundle. A proprietor may have the incident of income, but not the incident of management, for example, or vice versa. Yet two points can be made about Honoré’s list that do challenge Bundle Theory.

The first point is conceptual: while modifications in many cases may occur, Honoré’s list showed it was possible for there to be a ‘standard case’ of property. His list of incidents was not asserted to be a strict definition of property, demarcating its necessary-and-sufficient conditions. Rather, it outlined the basic features of the concept of property in a manner evocative of Wittgenstein’s idea of ‘family resemblance’. Even if Bundle Theory was right that there was no strict essence of property, the concept nevertheless displayed an array of central characteristics by which it could be recognized and utilized. Furthermore, with this standard set down, other more esoteric types of property could be modeled upon it by analogy.

The second point is the actual existence, in law and custom, of the full complement of Honoré’s property-incidents, in chattels at least, in many places across the globe. As Honoré argued with respect to umbrellas; and others did similarly with respect to automobiles and other moveables, property in such items very often amounts to Full Liberal Ownership. In application to chattels at least, there is – contrary to the claims of Bundle Theory – a striking consistency in the meaning of property.

Even with these two points acknowledged, however, Full Liberal Ownership has seemed to many theorists an overly comprehensive account of private property. While it may be difficult to deny the consistency in proprietorial entitlements over chattels, the problem cases put forward by Bundle Theory remain. Indeed, recent work on common property rights (such as the shared right to hunt a local wood, or fish a local stream) has expanded the array of property cases that struggle to fit the individualist Full Liberal Ownership mould. Likewise, the tension between the requirements of Full Liberal Ownership and political commitments to social justice and environmental sustainability are as relevant as ever. Indeed, the oft-cited declaration of Blackstone above – when set in the context of his famous Commentaries themselves – draws our attention to both the intuitive appeal of Full Liberal Ownership and its surprisingly limited application in the real world in the face of environmental problems and issues of social justice. For as any reader of the Commentaries quickly discovers, Blackstone’s book on property teems with all manner of exotic and overlapping proprietorial rights – in fishing, hunting, travel, foraging, pasturing, recreation and digging for turf or peat. Full Liberal Ownership hardly makes an appearance in the Commentaries even as an ideal type. In the last analysis, then, Full Liberal Ownership seems to be honored more in the breach than in the observance.

Much of the recent work in property theory can be seen as an attempt to navigate between the two poles of Full Liberal Ownership and Bundle Theory, aiming to provide an account that preserves the conceptual integrity of the former while allowing some of the descriptive and normative flexibility of the latter.

There are a variety of theoretical options open to the property theorist attempting such navigation. They may adopt a broader concept of property and then envisage Full Liberal Ownership as one conceptualization (that is, specification) of that larger idea (Waldron 1985). They may adopt a continuum concept of property, where ownership sits as the limit case at the very top of a spectrum of property entitlements, with lesser entitlements located further down the spectrum (Harris 1996). Or they may advance additional concepts of property that sit alongside ownership and aim to cover the cases it is perceived to miss (Breakey 2011). Perhaps the commonest response, however, is simply to relax a strict necessary-and-sufficient-conditions reading of Honoré’s incidents, and consider the usual elements located within the general idea of property.

4. The General Idea of Private Property: The Integrated Theory

Taking a broader perspective than Honoré, many contemporary property theorists accept a three-part approach to property. The general idea of private property, it is held, consists of the following three elements:

Exclusion: others may not enter or use the resource;

Use: the owner is free to use and consume the resource;

Management and Alienation: the owner is free to manage, sell, gift, bequeath or abandon the resource.

On this account, property owners are expected to have some level of each of these three types of entitlements. Full Liberal Ownership will emerge as the limit case of private property, arising when a property-holder has the maximum possible entitlement on the three dimensions of exclusion, use and alienation. Lesser types of property are still possible, provided they contain some threshold amount of these three elements.

This view is thus less absolutist and less comprehensive than Full Liberal Ownership; private property may be regulated or taxed, yet it still displays the signature properties of exclusion, use and alienability—it remains property. Equally though, this concept of property – Integrated Theory, as some have called it – departs from Bundle Theory by viewing property as a consolidated concept (Mossoff 2003). Whether we express property’s entitlements under the three categories of exclusion, use and alienation, or through Hohfeld’s jural relations or Honoré’s incidents, the thought is that its components integrate together to create a united sum that is larger than its parts. Contrary to the claims of Bundle Theory, it is argued, property is a larger, organic whole; the elements of property are not easily detached one from another, and a legal regime cannot simply pick and choose from them at will. Use, exclusion and alienation fit together like three pieces of a puzzle.

In what ways does Integrated Theory hold the elements of property to be conceptually linked? Expressing these conceptual links in terms of Honoré’s incidents, it seems reasonable to think that use includes and requires possession, and that management includes both of these. After all, one cannot manage a property without being able to use it, and one cannot use it without being able to enter it or hold it. Furthermore, income in the form of fruits, rents and profits seems to be a natural result of a property-holder gaining the benefits of possession, use and management respectively (Attas 2007). Likewise, immunities from expropriation are linked to all these incidents. One can’t manage or gain income from a resource if others can simply dissolve all one’s entitlements to it and use it for free.

As such, it is no easy matter for a property bundle on the one hand to include management and on the other to exclude income or immunity. The point may be argued similarly with respect to Hohfeld’s jural relations. While it is, strictly speaking, conceptually possible to distinguish between claim-rights against other’s trespass, liberties of use, and powers of management, it seems fair to say that such relations nevertheless sit very naturally alongside one another. It is difficult to understand what the point would be of having just one of these entitlements without having one or both of the others (Merrill 1998). (This inter-linkage explains, after all, why Hohfeld’s analysis was so groundbreaking, and why law students often struggle to grasp it: ordinary language naturally bunches together the elements that Hohfeld carefully distinguished.) As such, the disintegrated notion of property conjured up by Bundle Theory appears misleading. Analogizing to physics, while it might be true that atoms are made up of protons, neutrons and electrons, this does not mean that it is advisable to try splitting them into these component parts, or that it is possible to reconfigure them in any given alternative arrangement.

Even if it is accepted that there are deep conceptual and practical ties between the elements of property, however, the question may still arise: Which, if any, of the three elements above is the quintessential mark – the essential feature – of property? As the next several sections explain, many property theorists have departed from the Integrated Theory in holding that the essence of property is one or other of the three elements of exclusion, use and alienability – and some property theorists have looked even further afield. The question is not merely a theoretical one. The law often needs to determine whether a given regulation is or is not a violation of the property right – whether it is, for instance, a taking in respect of the Fifth Amendment of the United States Constitution. For such purposes, the question of the essence of property is pivotal. Is it found within exclusion, use, powers of alienation, or some further element?

5. Exclusion: Trespass-Based Theories

As Blackstone’s talk of ‘total exclusion’ suggests, perhaps the most intuitive answer to the question of property’s essence is the right to exclude.

Without question, the notion of exclusion captures an important aspect of most property entitlements: namely, the privileged relationship that one person has (or sometimes a group of people have) to a resource, as compared to other non-property-holders. It is not only the case that the property-holder can prohibit others from engaging with the owned resource, but also that the property-holder is themselves entitled to engage with that resource without requiring the say-so of any other person. The idea of one person excluding others helpfully captures this one-rule-for-me/one-rule-for-everyone-else feature of property entitlements.

Even so, it is important to clarify what is meant by the ‘right to exclude’. In the context of property theory, ‘exclude’ is ambiguous. In the literature it is possible to find the idea of exclusion being applied willy-nilly to very different entities—to resources, activities, values, interests and even to the property right itself (Merrill 1998). Predictably, the term shifts somewhat in meaning in each of these different applications, at times meaning little more than ‘prohibit’, while at others meaning protection from harm, or protection from interference, or protection from trespass or loss in value. These are all distinct notions, and many of them are applicable not only to property rights, but also to many ordinary rights that are not usually spoken of in either proprietorial or exclusionary terms. (Many rights protect a person from harm, for example, but that does not make them property rights.) In shifting from one use of ‘exclude’ to another, it is possible to create a misleading impression that property-entitlements are more consistent across contexts than in fact they are.

The plainest meaning of a ‘right to exclude’, and the one adopted by most Exclusion Theorists, refers to the physical crossing by a person of a physical boundary – it refers, that is, to the idea of trespass. On this footing, it is the essence of property to have a right to exclude others from entering one’s land or possessing one’s chattels – or, to put the point more precisely and technically, it is the essence of property to have a Hohfeldian claim-right constituted by others’ duties to exclude themselves from the resource (Penner 1997). Put more simply, property implies that there is a boundary around the border of the owned entity that non-owners may not cross without the consent of the property-holder.

This does not mean non-owners cannot use or impact upon the resource if they are able to do so without actually entering or possessing it. For instance, the duty to exclude oneself from a garden does not mean that one cannot enjoy looking upon it on one’s way to work. Nor does it mean that one cannot pick up some tips for one’s own gardening endeavours from appreciation of its arrangement. In this respect Exclusion Theory’s focus on physical border-crossing parallels closely the way property-cases are often decided in law. As Lord Camden put it in the eighteenth century, ‘the eye cannot by the laws of England be guilty of a trespass’; that is, one can trespass with one’s feet or with one’s hands, but not merely by looking and listening. Equally however, the focus on border-crossing allows the possibility that a person can impact negatively on another’s property provided one does not enter onto it. For instance, Annie’s pumping out the groundwater on her property may cause Bob’s land to collapse, but Annie has not breached any duty to exclude herself from physically entering Bob’s property. The law on such questions tends to be more equivocal—in some jurisdictions it will determine that Annie’s action violated Bob’s property-right, but in other jurisdictions it will not. Even still, it is unquestionably true that harms which involve physical trespass are treated in law very differently, and usually more harshly, than harms which do not. As such, Exclusion Theory rightly directs attention to property’s allocation of specific resources to specific individuals, and the usefulness of physical encroachment as a trigger for legal action.

Several critiques may be made of Exclusion Theory. On a theoretical and normative level, some have argued that the focus on exclusion deflects attention from the way exclusion integrates with the more fundamental idea of use (Mossoff 2003). In a sense, Exclusion Theory can be thought of as a theory of non-ownership: it focuses on what property means for those who do not have it, rather than for those who do (Katz 2008). Equally though, a defender of the theory may argue that Exclusion Theory rightly places attention on the element of property that most cries out for justification—its imposition of constraining duties on everyone but the property-holder. In this respect, it is arguable that Exclusion Theory helpfully expresses a widespread and important moral norm of inviolability – the idea that some things are off-limits to people (Balgandesh 2008).

On a descriptive level, the question may be raised whether the right to exclude accurately captures the idea of property at work in applications outside the simple cases of land and chattels. This is particularly true with respect to property over intangibles, including intellectual property rights like copyright and patent, which grant entitlements over created artistic works and inventions. In such cases, Exclusion Theory’s usual reliance on the natural boundaries of the thing (the physical borders of the chattel or the land) and the notion of physical crossing apply less straightforwardly, and much controversy surrounds whether the theory manages to account for these sorts of intellectual properties. Even in application to real property, however, there are entitlements that Exclusion Theory can struggle to explain. For instance, exclusion does not seem to be a primary element of property in cases where multiple persons have overlapping properties in the one resource. Plainly, none of them can exclude each other, yet they all seem to have property.

6. Use: Harm-Based Theories

Rather than focusing on exclusion, attention may be directed at property’s capacity to protect particular uses of, and activities performed upon, a given resource. On this perspective – which might be termed Harm Theory – the essence of a property-right in some resource is not to prohibit others from trespassing across the resource’s boundaries, but instead to prohibit others from harming certain of the property-holder’s uses of the resource. These protected uses may in some cases be very specific, as occurs with fishing rights or mining rights. Or the protected uses may include a wide cluster of activities—for instance as may be gathered under the idea of protecting an owner’s quiet enjoyment of his land. The ancient property law of sic utere tuo (use your own so as to do no harm to others) may be invoked here: rather than Annie simply respecting the boundaries of Bob’s land by not crossing them, she is required to ensure that her use of her property does not harm Bob’s use of his (Freyfogle 2003). Rather than trespass, the focus shifts to notions of harm, nuisance, interference and worsening. To be sure, these concepts will often overlap with trespass, but they are not identical. There are many cases where protection of an activity from harm or interference will not require – or will require more than – rules against crossing a physical boundary.

In this respect, Harm Theory differs on practical matters from Exclusion Theory in two sets of cases. First, it will not consider boundary-crossing to be a necessary violation of the property right. The question, rather, will be whether the boundary crossing was in some sense harmful to the property-holder, given the use or set of uses to which that property holder is putting the property. If the boundary-crossing was not detrimental to the property-holder’s project, then there is ‘no-harm, no-foul’. In this first case, the duties imposed by Harm Theory are less extensive than Exclusion Theory, as some cases of boundary-crossing will not be violations of the right. Second, however, the Harm Approach will protect the earmarked uses even from the harmful actions of others who do not cross the property-boundary. As such, Annie pumping out groundwater that causes Bob’s property to collapse, or Annie building structures that block sunlight from Bob’s solar array, or Annie blocking access-ways to Bob’s property, or Annie flooding Bob’s property by damming the creek on Annie’s property, may all be violations of Bob’s property rights. In this second set of cases, the duties imposed by Harm Theory are more extensive than those created by Exclusion Theory, as they reach out to affect others operating outside the property’s borders.

Descriptively, Harm Theory can account for the many cases of apparent trespass – boundary-crossing even against the explicit will of the property-holder – that are not held to be legal violations of the property right because they were not deemed to be harmful to the property-holder’s activities (Katz 2008). In response however, the Exclusion Theorist can marshal example cases in law where trespass was prioritized over harm, and it is not easy to perceive a clear victor in this debate. However, the Harm Theorist does have one, perhaps not-so-minor, area where their account is clearly descriptively superior; this is in respect of overlapping property rights.

a. Overlapping Property: Common and Resource Property Rights

Rights to a common resource – where everyone in a given community can use the resource – come in a variety of different forms. Two are worth considering here. First, there are open access regimes, where all persons can access the resource and either: a) there are no constraints on what they may do on or with that resource, or, b) there are constraints, but these constraints allow space for people to worsen the resource in respect of the uses they and others put the resource to. Fisheries are often examples of open access regimes; everyone in the community may have the right to access and to fish in the local lake, but their unrestrained fishing ultimately impacts detrimentally on the capacity of the lake to provide fish. As Garret Hardin famously showed in The Tragedy of the Commons, in such a situation rational agents may be expected to exploit the resource to the detriment of everyone (Hardin 1968).

In at least some cases, however, communities are able to develop constraints on each person’s uses of the resource so as to ensure the resource sustains its capacity for the specified uses over long periods of time (Ostrom 1990). Sometimes these systems may be quite simple, such as the rules that determine how parks, beaches and wildlife-reserves operate, allowing all citizens access and enjoyment without destroying the resource for others. When a common resource factors in production, however, a heavier toll is taken on the resource, and more sophisticated systems are usually required to ensure its sustainability. For instance, a community may adopt a ‘wintering rule’ with respect to pasturing their cows on a commons, such that no member can pasture more cows during the summer than they can feed off their own supplies through the winter. By capping herd-numbers in this way, the commons can be protected from over-exploitation. These sort of constraints may be thought of as protecting certain uses from the harmful acts of others, and so as a species of harm-based property entitlements. One recent account of such entitlements understands common property as ‘property-protected activities’ occurring on specific tethered resources. Such property-protection includes four types of property incidents: (i) the entitlement of the property-holder to access the resource, (ii) the entitlement to use the resource for the specific activity in question (e.g. fishing, foraging), (iii) the ownership of the fruits or profits of that activity, and (iv) the claim-rights over other users that they do not worsen (harm) the resource in respect of the specific property-protected activity (Breakey 2011).

Such harm-based accounts also aim to explain the many cases of multiple property entitlements in a single resource where such overlapping entitlements are not spread across the entire community. For example, one family in a community may have foraging rights for fruit in a local common, several families may have hunting rights, and everyone in the community may have the right to gather firewood. So long as there are effective constraints on each activity ensuring that it does not harm the others, the regime is not one of open-access, but a species of property. Again, Harm Theory can make sense of these properties by focusing not on trespass over physical boundaries (as Exclusion Theory does) but rather on the ongoing protection of certain specific uses of the tethered resource.

Normatively, one of the advantages of Harm Theory is that it tightly links the concept of property to some of the more popular ethical justifications for property rights. For instance, if property is intended to be justified because it allows people to do things—to perform ongoing productive or preserving projects over time, and to more generally reap the consequences of their actions, then one might think that the primary focus should be on protecting those projects from harm. As such, protecting people’s labour (with John Locke) or their expectations about the fruits of their labour (with Jeremy Bentham) brings harm, and not exclusion, to the foreground.

Inevitably however, Harm Theory invites its own particular critiques. First, the legal protection of some uses and not others makes Harm Theories of property explicitly political in a way that Exclusion Theory for the most part avoids. On the Harm Theory, property is not neutral among the different acts property-holders might want to perform, but necessarily selects amongst them. Exclusion Theory, on the other hand, merely sets up boundaries and lets owners decide what to do within them. Second, this privileging of use threatens to derail the idea (and enormous practical utility, in terms of information costs) of property as an integrated concept consistent across contexts; a ‘bundle of uses’ may be little improvement on a ‘bundle of entitlements’ (Merrill and Smith 2001). Third, and perhaps most seriously, the fixed and specific uses (or sets of uses) that property-holders are entitled to engage in seems to depart from a very basic and intuitive thought about private property, which is that it is for the owner to decide what will happen on their property, and that their choices on this matter are to some extent genuinely open-ended. Harm Theory delimits which acts will be property-protected, and so constrains – in some cases very considerably – a property-holder’s capacity to determine what will happen on the property. As such, it may be that Harm Theory can only augment, but cannot hope to replace, rival theories of property like Exclusion Theory.

Ultimately it may be that property should be best understood as a mix of the Exclusion and Harm Theories, whereby both trespass and harm should be factored into our larger concept of property. One obvious reason for adopting this sort of mixed theory is that protecting against trespass often will be the most effective way of protecting against harm; it is far easier to detect trespassers than harmers (Ellickson 1993). This mixed view is also reflected in much legal case-law, where notions of trespass and boundary (from Exclusion Theory) interweave amongst notions of nuisance, quiet enjoyment and do-no-harm (from Harm Theory). If this combination of the two theories is correct, however, this would be an important conceptual result, because it introduces a tension into the very heart of property (Singer 2000; Freyfogle 2003). It means that in at least some cases we cannot know a priori (that is, simply from application of the concept of property) whether a property-holder or a non-property holder is entitled to perform a particular act until we settle the question of what uses are being protected from harm, what happens when two protected uses clash, and whether harm will trump trespass in this particular case.

7. Power-Based Theories: The Question of Alienation

The two theories just covered – Exclusion and Harm – share a common focus on what are called ‘first-order Hohfeldian jural relations’ (see §2 above). In particular, their dispute surrounds which types of claim-rights are held by property-owners, where the choice is between claim-rights prohibiting others from trespassing, or claim-rights prohibiting others from harming. But it is arguable that this dispute misplaces altogether the unique nature of property in terms of its second-order Hohfeldian jural relations, especially ‘powers’ (the capacity to alter others’ claim-rights with respect to the owned resource).

It has long been held by political philosophers of very different stripes that it is the quintessential mark of property that it can be traded in a marketplace. Courts of law have made similar judgments, recognizing an entitlement as property once it is established that the entitlement is tradable. Such rights of trade – as well as associated powers of waiver, management and abandonment – are second-order Hohfeldian powers, allowing an owner to alter the normative standing of others with respect to the resource. On the Power Theory, as it might be termed, to know whether a particular right is property, the decisive question to ask is whether it can be traded for money; Annie’s property essentially involves Annie having the power to altogether transfer (alienate) her rights over the resource to Bob, so that Bob becomes the property-holder, and Annie loses her property-rights with respect to that resource. Moreover, Annie can perform this alienation on condition of a like alienation by Bob, such that they trade property, or exchange property for money. On this view, an item of property is necessarily tradable, and so necessarily a commodity. As such, if a society has property rights then it necessarily has to some extent a market economy (at least with respect to those objects over which property is held).

While many theorists and laypeople view the relationship between property and commodity as simply intuitive, others mount arguments aiming to tie the two together theoretically. For instance, it may be argued that accounts of property need to pay heed to the fact that Bob’s duties with respect to Annie’s property are owed to Annie and not to society at large, and that allowing Annie to alienate those duties as she sees fit is a necessary implication of the fact that the duties are owed to her (Dorfman 2010). This line of thought on property rights may be bolstered by appeal to the ‘will/choice theory of rights,’ which holds that it is of the essence of rights more generally to be waivable and transferable (Steiner 1994). If the power to make choices over the duties others owe to us is an essential feature of rights in general, then it is plausible to think that it will also be a feature of property rights more particularly.

Against this proposed assimilation of property with commodity, however, many property theorists have argued that the essence of property need not include full powers of alienation and that there are attractive, integrated concepts of property without this element. Examples of property concepts explicitly avoiding alienation include the idea of personal property—familiar from both socialist theory and practice. Personal property may be characterized as property that cannot be sold, but which can be licensed out (Radin 1982). Other subtle variations are possible, allowing some forms of alienation and waiver, but not others. For instance, it has been argued that the concept of property necessarily allows for bequeathal and gift but does not necessarily include the power of sale. On this view, a property-holder can always give away her property or leave it to her children; to sell the property, however, requires the additional concept of contract (Penner 1997). Another variation holds that the concept of property includes the capacity for certain types of trade, but not the entitlement to receive income from managing the property (Christman 1991). A further variation again – one common in both law and custom – is the ‘classic usufruct’, where the property is held until the death of the property-holder, but cannot be transferred during their lifetime (Ellickson 1993).

One challenge arising for such accounts is that it is hard to draw a conceptual line in the sand between the types of Hohfeldian powers a property-holder does and does not have. Almost everyone will agree, for instance, that property-rights include the power of waiver – that is, that Annie is able to consent to Bob entering her land by waiving Bob’s duties of non-trespass. But it can be difficult to see how Annie can have a power of waiver without thereby having the power to manage; the capacity to consent to another person’s entry onto the property under stipulated conditions effectively allows the property-holder to manage what happens on the property. But from there, it is difficult to see how Annie can have the power of management without also having rights to income, as she can make one of the stipulated conditions for Bob’s entry onto the property that she receives some of what Bob produces. Similarly, it can be difficult to draw a strong distinction between Annie being able to give away her property at her discretion, and her being able to transfer it for money.

To be sure, this difficulty in specifying exactly which Hohfeldian powers of transfer are essential incidents of property is not impossible to overcome—and certainly neither law nor custom has any problem allowing some powers of transfer and prohibiting others (Ellickson 1993). But the existence of the difficulty does suggest that all these powers sit on a continuum, and that when crafting an integrated, coherent property-concept, the absence of a clear distinction between these powers at any given point has led different theorists to draw the line in quite different – and sometimes enormously subtle – places. Perhaps all this difficulty implies is that when seeking integrated property concepts, the conceptual linkages between Honoré’s incidents and between Hohfeld’s jural relations mean that such categories should not be relied upon to provide the desired boundaries. With this in mind, §10 below describes two theories of property that cut across the dimensions described by Honoré’s and Hohfeld’s systems. Alternatively, another response is to make property’s powers a continuum concept. An example of this idea is J. W. Harris’ theory of property (Harris 1996). For Harris, property has two necessary elements: trespassory rules (familiar from the Exclusion Theory described above in §5) and the ownership spectrum. The ownership spectrum is a continuum ranging from personal use-privileges to control-powers allowing management and – at the very top of the spectrum – full alienation. Harris is then able to specify distinct types of property – half property, mere-property, and full-blooded ownership – as residing at distinct points on this ownership spectrum.

8. Immunity-Based Theories

An additional type of second-order Hohfelidan jural relation is implicated in property. Rather than focusing concern on how Annie can alter others’ duties with respect to the property (the question of powers), attention may be turned to the manner in which Annie is protected from having her standing with respect to the property altered by others (the question of immunity).

Some degree of immunity is an essential element of property. If Annie has an entitlement to a resource that can be dissolved merely by Bob’s say-so, then it seems fair to say that Annie does not have property in that resource, but only some lesser entitlement. More specifically, if Annie holds property over Blackacre, then her neighbor Bob cannot, without Annie’s consent, transfer the ownership of Blackacre to himself; Bob cannot expropriate Blackacre. As such, some degree of immunity from the non-consensual dissolution of a property-holder’s entitlements over her owned resource appears to be a necessary condition of property.

Interestingly, the seventeenth century political philosopher John Locke took seriously the possibility that an immunity from expropriation was a sufficient condition for property. He thought that any entitlement that could not be removed by others counted as property, defining property as ‘that without a man’s own consent it cannot be taken from him.’ Such a position accounts for the very wide concept of property that Locke used at various points throughout his famous Two Treatises on Government. Since many ordinary rights (such as to free speech and bodily security) are immunized from others’ dissolution, advancing such an immunity as a sufficient condition of property means that property encompasses all natural or human rights. This perhaps seems to a modern eye to explode rather than inform the concept of property.

Even making an immunity from expropriation only a necessary condition of property is controversial however, as it seems to imply that much (perhaps all) takings or taxation by the government necessarily impinges on property. Clearly, there are significant consequences at stake here for distributive justice, as taxation in market economies is the primary source of funds for state welfare, education and healthcare. For this reason, various attempts have been made to define integrated property concepts so as to leave space for taxation. For instance, one approach grants immunity against expropriation so long as the property-holder is engaging purely with their own property, but weakens that immunity when the property-holder starts to derive market income through management or sale of the property (Christman 1991). Such an approach ties the question of immunity to the question of transfer and alienation discussed in the previous section (§7). Against such attempts, it has been argued that all concepts of property allowing the possibility of non-consensual expropriation necessarily have a strained sense about them, as they artificially try to make the concept of property compatible with its own extinction (Attas 2007). On this view, while various regulations of property may be consistent with the idea of property, expropriation itself cannot be a part of the concept. If we are committed to taxation, it is argued, property’s essential tie to immunity from expropriation means we must entirely forgo property as an organizing idea for our economic and political systems.

9. Remedy-Based Theories

Previous sections have located the essence of property in first-order Hohfeldian claim-rights (claim-rights prohibiting exclusion and harm) and second-order Hohfeldian jural relations (powers of transfer and immunity from expropriation). But there is one further dimension on which property may be characterized: remedies—the question of what is done when the rules of property are broken.

An influential theory developed by legal scholars Calabresi and Melamed distinguishes property-rules from liability-rules and inalienability-rules (Calabresi and Melamed 1972). Property-rules are those entitlements that may only be removed with the consent of the rights-holder; the rights-holder gets to name the conditions under which they consent to extinguish the entitlements that would otherwise apply. Liability-rules, on the other hand, allow entitlements to be removed by a party so long as that party pays a specific cost. This cost is objectively determined by the state, and not by the subjective choice of the entitlement-holder. Inalienability-rules prevent entitlements being removed or transferred at all; if an entitlement is inalienable then even the right-holder herself cannot waive or alienate the entitlement. Different rules can apply to the same resource in different contexts. For instance, a person’s home is usually protected by property-rules with respect to other citizens (who, if they want to buy, must meet the owner’s asking price) but is only protected by liability-rules with respect to the state (as the state can use its powers of eminent domain to remove the entitlements in return for an objectively determined payment to the homeowner). Calabresi and Melamed’s distinction has relevance to the issues of immunities and powers discussed in the last two sections (§7-8). With respect to powers it implies that entitlements protected by inalienability-rules are not property, and thus that property implies alienability; and that entitlements protected only by a liability-rule are not property. With respect to immunities, the use of property-rules rather than liability-rules implies that property includes an immunity from forced transfer (by ordinary citizens, at least) through payment of an objectively determined sum.

Additionally though, Calabresi and Melamed’s analysis applies to remedies: the question of what happens when the initial rules (whatever they are) are broken. Imagine Bob illicitly breaches Annie’s property rights in X by taking X. However, upon being caught Bob gets to keep X, and only has to pay Annie a (non-punitive) objectively determined estimation of the cost of X. While the letter of the law may say that Bob has a duty to exclude himself from taking Annie’s property, in reality Bob can take what he wants from Annie and then simply pay the cost for that item as determined by the state. In such a case it may be doubted whether Annie really has a property right at all. Similarly, if Bob is found to be engaged in an ongoing breach of Annie’s property rights, it may seem obvious that a court will order Bob to stop his ongoing violation (this is called ordering  an injunction or injunctive relief), rather than merely imposing an objectively-determined cost of damages upon Bob and letting him continue the violation. But appearances can be deceiving. If Bob accidentally built his house on some of Annie’s land, the court may award damages to Annie but not force Bob to remove his transgressing building—and there are other cases where property-violations are not automatically granted injunctive relief (Balgandesh 2008). Ultimately, then, while there is clearly some conceptual relationship between property rights and the types of remedies that are to be applied if and when those rights are violated, precisely what that relationship amounts to is controversial. Perhaps the most that can be said with confidence is that property remedies, reflective of the fact that property’s duties are owed to the property-holder, must be a part of private law as well as public law, and so must in principle allow owners to seek damages over violations of their property rights, as well as allowing the state to perform criminal sanctions on the person who violated those rights (Dorfman 2010).

10. Examples of Cross-Cutting Theories

The foregoing five sections have described theories focusing in turn on one particular dimension of property: claim-rights, powers, immunities or remedies. It may be, however, that the best theory of property will be one that cuts across these dimensions and carries implications for all of them. Two examples of such cross-cutting theories follow.

a. Radin and Property for Personhood

In her influential 1982 article Property and Personhood Margaret Radin does not aim to provide a general theory of property, but seeks instead to explore one specific type of property relationship: the personality theory of property. This theory describes the specific cases where property comes to be, in a deep philosophical sense, a part of the person who owns it. Arising through the significance of things in constituting our memories, our actions, our individuality and our continuing plans and expectations, this type of deep attachment between person and thing (consider wedding rings and other items with sentimental value) gives rise to a theory of property-for-personhood with implications for each of the dimensions listed above.

In terms of claim-rights, the inviolability and sanctity of property-for-personhood implies the centrality of rights of exclusion from the object itself. It is important that nameless others do not access and use the personal object, rather than merely prohibiting their harming it in some fashion. Turning to powers, as part of the owner’s person, personal property is not a commodity; it is precisely the definition of personal property that it is not freely exchangeable for functional equivalents or for its market price. While this does not automatically mean alienation should be legally prohibited for such items (an object can shift over time from one category to another, so implementing such a rule would be difficult), it is at least clear that powers of alienation are not an essential part of the entitlements of property-for-personhood. In terms of immunities and remedies, property-for-personhood warrants the stronger protection of Calabresi and Melamed’s property-rule rather than the lesser protection afforded by a mere liability-rule. Other citizens – and perhaps even the state – should not be able to expropriate parts of a property-holder’s very person. Reflective of this, courts would be expected to utilize injunctive relief (that is, they would order the defendant cease the violating behaviour) as remedies in the case of a continuing violation of property-for-personhood, rather than merely awarding damages. In this way, the implications of a specific concept of property can be traced as they cut across the several dimensions described above.

b. Katz and Ownership as Agenda-Setting

Recently, Larissa Katz has advanced an agenda-setting theory of property in land, whereby the property-owner has the supreme power to set the agenda for the property (Katz 2008). This theory can be viewed as a sophisticated combination of a Harm Theory and a Power Theory. The theory says that a property owner can exclusively choose what particular type of act they will perform on the property – for instance, they may adopt residential, agricultural, or various sorts of industrial uses of their land. This is no mere liberty of action however—with the performance of these different activities, the owner sets the agenda for the property, shaping the duties of others with respect to that property. Non-owners have different clusters of duties imposed upon them depending upon the activity that has been undertaken by the owner; they must accord their behaviour, vis-à-vis the resource, with the agenda that has been set. As such, the agenda-setting capacity is a Hohfeldian power that alters the duties of non-owners with respect to the resource. Once the agenda is set through the owner’s chosen activities, the ensuing entitlements are thereafter modeled by the Harm Theory; others may be allowed to cross the boundaries of the property in a variety of contexts, but in doing so they must ensure their actions do not impact upon the specific activity that the owner is performing. The agenda, but not the thing, shapes the duties of others, and harm, but not exclusion, is prioritized.

11. Socialist and Egalitarian Property

Much of the foregoing has considered different theories of private property—with the exception being the universal endowments of common property discussed in §6.1. But it may be enquired what sort of property concepts arise from socialist theory and practice. Naturally, there are many different answers to this question, particularly if its scope is expanded to include, say, contemporary theories of market socialism (which aim to assimilate socialist theories of justice with elements of market-based economies), the types of property relationships that were expected to emerge during the transition from capitalism to socialism, and the various types of property existing in law and de facto in particular socialist regimes throughout recent history. In the main, however, two answers predominate.

At least since the beginning of the twentieth century, socialism has been identified with the public ownership of the means of production. This directly implies the collective ownership of those assets playing a role in production. Equally though, it leaves room for each person to hold property – even private property – in particular resources, provided these entitlements do not allow for private production to occur. With this restriction in mind, concepts of private property available for use in socialist regimes will exclude market transfers, with the intention of facilitating the elements of property that allow personal use, and prohibiting those that allow control over other persons. Individual citizens thus will be entitled to personal property (§7) and to property-for-personhood as Radin defined that term (§10.1), and they may also have common property in certain public amenities.

As well as the non-productive property entitlements of individual persons, the defining feature of a socialist economy is that productive resources are collectively owned. There are three features of such ownership. First, the group as a whole, or some subset understood to be representative of that whole, determines the use to which a resource will be put and manages the resource. Second, decisions on how the resource will be used are made through reference to the collective interest; the property is to be managed in order to produce what the collective requires. Third, the property’s management must also instantiate the proper empowerment of those citizens who labour upon it; workers must not be alienated from their labour even for the sake of public benefit elsewhere.

Naturally, this general characterization may be filled out in very different ways, depending upon who represents the collective, how centralized their decision-making is, how the collective’s interests are defined, what counts as proper empowerment, how the relationship between collective and personal property is managed, and so on (Kulikov 1988). Cooperative property and to an extent some of the property systems of communes may be understood as collective property writ on a smaller scale—being held by small communities and working groups rather than entire nation-states. More decentralized socialist regimes have made extensive use of this form of productive arrangement.

There is one further property-concept worth noting here: joint ownership. A resource is jointly-owned when each member of a community has a veto-right over what may be done or produced on the resource; no production is allowed without the prior agreement of every member. This concept of property is rarely found in law or custom. Its most common use is as a theoretical device for modeling an initial normative relation between people and land (Cohen 1995). In this way joint ownership sets down an imagined initial situation where no productive action can occur without the agreement of every joint owner. This standpoint then serves as a conceptual point of departure from which further contracting can occur. There are good reasons for thinking that the property-entitlements arising from such contracting will be highly egalitarian, as the veto-power joint ownership gives each member of the society will allow them to bargain for a share of whatever is produced.

12. References and Further Reading

Bundle Theory and the Disintegration of Property

  • Hohfeld, W. “Fundamental Legal Conceptions as Applied in Judicial Reasoning.” Yale Law Journal 23 (1913): 16-59; (Contined in YLJ 26, 1917: 710-69.)
    • Landmark pair of articles analysing rights (including property rights) into constituent parts.
  • Cohen, Felix. “Transcendental Nonsense and the Functional Approach.” Columbia Law Review 35.6 (1935): 809-49.
    • Advocates a scientific and functional approach to law; argues the concept of property (among others) to be an unwanted supernatural entity.
  • Grey, Thomas. “The Disintegration of Property.” Property: Nomos XXII. Eds. Pennock, J. Roland and J. W. Chapman. New York: New York University Press, 1980. 69-86.
    • Influential argument against integrated concepts of property.
  • Merrill, Thomas, and Henry Smith. “What Happened to Property in Law and Economics?” Yale Law Journal 111 (2001): 357-98.
    • Illustrates why Coase-inspired property theorists gravitated toward the Bundle (and also use/harm) approach; argues this approach obscures crucial features of property.

Full Liberal Ownership

  • Honoré, A. “Ownership.” Oxford Essays in Jurisprudence. Ed. Guest, A. London: Oxford University Press, 1961. 107-47.
    • Seminal article listing eleven incidents of Full Liberal Ownership (often used as a comprehensive list of the potential sticks in property’s bundle).
  • Epstein, Richard. Takings: Private Property and the Power of Eminent Domain. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1985.
    • Influential libertarian reading of the US Takings Clause through the Hohfeldian lens; argues the dissolution of any incident of property is a taking of property.

Integrated Theory

  • Mossoff, Adam. “What Is Property?” Arizona Law Review 45 (2003): 371-443.
    • Sustained argument for Integrated Theory, including its historical pedigree from the early modern period in Grotius and Locke.

Exclusion Theories

  • Balgandesh, Shyamkrishna. “Demystifying the Right to Exclude: Of Property, Inviolability and Automatic Injunctions.” Harvard Journal of Law and Public Policy 31 (2008): 593-661.
    • Argues that property is based on a principle of inviolability, and so constituted by claim-rights that others exclude themselves. Argues against remedy-based property theories like Calabresi and Melamed’s.
  • Merrill, Thomas. “Property and the Right to Exclude.” Nebraska Law Review 77 (1998): 730-55.
    • Argues the essence of property is the right to exclude, from which the other aspects of property can be derived.
  • Penner, J. The Idea of Property in Law. Oxford: Clarendon, 1997.
    • Classic statement of exclusion theory; property includes powers of abandonment and gift, but not alienation, which requires the addition of the concept of contract in law.

Harm-Based Theories, including Common Property

  • Ostrom, Elinor. Governing the Commons: The Evolution of Institutions for Collective Action. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
    • Influential study of common property, describing its diversity, nature, history and variable capacity to resist tragedy.
  • Breakey, Hugh. “Two Concepts of Property: Ownership of Things and Property in Activities.” The Philosophical Forum 42.3 (2011): 239-65.
    • Argues that a (Harm-based) concept of property-protected activities solves problem cases (common property, resource property, property in labour, etc.) encountered by Exclusion Theory.
  • Hardin, Garrett. “The Tragedy of the Commons.” Science 162 (1968): 1243-48.
    • Landmark article describing how rational actors degrade common (read open-access) resources.

Environmental and Community-Based Conceptions of Property

  • Freyfogle, Eric. The Land We Share. London: Shearwater Books, 2003.
    • Describes the fluidty and diversity of property-entitlements through US history, and their responsiveness to community and ecological needs; emphasizes internal tensions within property entitlements.
  • Singer, Joseph. Entitlement. London: Yale University Press, 2000.
    • Argues control over a property should be delineated by individuals’ protected interests in that property, rather than by abstract notions of ownership; marshals an array of tensions within ownership.

Power-Based Theory

  • Dorfman, Avihay. “Private Ownership.” Legal Theory 16 (2010): 1-35.
    • Identifies property with the capacity to alter others’ normative standing with respect to the resource. Links this feature with property’s status in private law.
  • Christman, John. “Self-Ownership, Equality, and the Structure of Property Rights.” Political Theory 19.1 (1991): 28-46.
    • Distinguishes property’s ‘use’ rights (including alienation) from its ‘control’ rights (especially income), and argues for the ethical priority of the former.
  • Steiner, Hillel. An Essay on Rights. Oxford: Blackwell, 1994.
    • Links Will/Choice theory of rights to property entitlements in developing a left-libertarian position.

Immunity-Based Theory

  • Attas, Daniel. “Fragmenting Property.” Law and Philosophy 25.1 (2007): 119-49.
    • Describes structural relations between Honore’s property-incidents; argues immunity from expropriation is a necessary incident of property.

Remedy-Based Theory

  • Calabresi, G., and D. Melamed. “Property Rule, Liability Rules and Inalienability: One View of the Cathedral.” Harvard Law Review 85 (1972): 1089-1128.
    • Focusing on remedies and immunities, distinguishes property-rules, inalienability-rules and liability-rules.

Cross-Cutting Theories

  • Katz, Larissa. “Exclusion and Exclusivity in Property Law.” University of Toronto Law Journal 58.3 (2008): 275-315.
    • ‘Agenda-setting’ theory of property: property’s duties are not set by exclusion from the resource, but rather shaped to conform with the agenda the owner has set for the resource.
  • Radin, Margaret. “Property and Personhood.” Stanford Law Review 34 (1982): 957-1015.
    • Definitive account of the personhood theory of property; investigates the special case where property forms part of the person of the property-holder.

Socialist Property

  • Kulikov, V. V. “The Structure and Forms of Socialist Property.” Problems of Economics 31.1 (1988): 14-29.
    • Details the two major forms of property applicable to socialist regimes (collective and personal property) and their inter-relation. Considers the use of personal private production in Soviet socialism.
  • Cohen, Gerald. Self-Ownership, Freedom and Equality. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • Searching investigation of normative implications of different property regimes. Chapter  4 describes ‘Joint Ownership’.

General Literature

  • Ellickson, Robert. “Property in Land.” Yale Law Journal 102 (1993): 1315-400.
    • Detailed analysis of the complexities of property in land, combining historical cases and rational-actor theory, and considering private, common, and communal property-arrangements.
  • Wenar, Leif. “The Concept of Property and the Takings Clause.” Columbia Law Review 97 (1997): 1923-46.
    • Argues, with special reference to the US takings clause, that property should be viewed as the thing that is the object of (Hohfeldian) property rights.
  • Harris, James. Property and Justice. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
    • Property based on twin notions of trespassory rules and the ‘ownership spectrum’, a continuum ranging from mere use-privileges through to control-powers and alienation.
  • Waldron, Jeremy. “What Is Private Property?” Oxford Journal of Legal Studies 5 (1985): 313-49.
    • Sustained argument against property skepticism; private property is a broad concept (that resources are allocated to particular individuals, who determine their use) of which particular conceptions are possible. Considers common and collective property.
  • Locke, John. Two Treatises of Government. New York: Hafner, 1947 (1689).
    • Perhaps the most influential treatise on property ever penned, though subject to divergent interpretations. As well as the famous Chapter Five of the Second Treatise, see First Treatise sections 39-41, 86-92 and Second Treatise sections 135-40, 159, 172-74.
  • Macpherson, C. B., ed. Property: Mainstream and Critical Positions. Toronto: University of Toronto, 1978.
    • Useful anthology of major property theorists throughout history, and more recent critical arguments.


Author Information

Hugh Breakey
Griffith University


Explaining the nature of consciousness is one of the most important and perplexing areas of philosophy, but the concept is notoriously ambiguous. The abstract noun “consciousness” is not frequently used by itself in the contemporary literature, but is originally derived from the Latin con (with) and scire (to know). Perhaps the most commonly used contemporary notion of a conscious mental state is captured by Thomas Nagel’s famous “what it is like” sense (Nagel 1974). When I am in a conscious mental state, there is something it is like for me to be in that state from the subjective or first-person point of view. But how are we to understand this? For instance, how is the conscious mental state related to the body? Can consciousness be explained in terms of brain activity? What makes a mental state be a conscious mental state? The problem of consciousness is arguably the most central issue in current philosophy of mind and is also importantly related to major traditional topics in metaphysics, such as the possibility of immortality and the belief in free will. This article focuses on Western theories and conceptions of consciousness, especially as found in contemporary analytic philosophy of mind.

The two broad, traditional and competing theories of mind are dualism and materialism (or physicalism). While there are many versions of each, the former generally holds that the conscious mind or a conscious mental state is non-physical in some sense, whereas the latter holds that, to put it crudely, the mind is the brain, or is caused by neural activity. It is against this general backdrop that many answers to the above questions are formulated and developed. There are also many familiar objections to both materialism and dualism. For example, it is often said that materialism cannot truly explain just how or why some brain states are conscious, and that there is an important “explanatory gap” between mind and matter. On the other hand, dualism faces the problem of explaining how a non-physical substance or mental state can causally interact with the physical body.

Some philosophers attempt to explain consciousness directly in neurophysiological or physical terms, while others offer cognitive theories of consciousness whereby conscious mental states are reduced to some kind of representational relation between mental states and the world. There are a number of such representational theories of consciousness currently on the market, including higher-order theories which hold that what makes a mental state conscious is that the subject is aware of it in some sense. The relationship between consciousness and science is also central in much current theorizing on this topic: How does the brain “bind together” various sensory inputs to produce a unified subjective experience? What are the neural correlates of consciousness? What can be learned from abnormal psychology which might help us to understand normal consciousness? To what extent are animal minds different from human minds? Could an appropriately programmed machine be conscious?

Table of Contents

  1. Terminological Matters: Various Concepts of Consciousness
  2. Some History on the Topic
  3. The Metaphysics of Consciousness: Materialism vs. Dualism
    1. Dualism: General Support and Related Issues
      1. Substance Dualism and Objections
      2. Other Forms of Dualism
    2. Materialism: General Support
      1. Objection 1: The Explanatory Gap and The Hard Problem
      2. Objection 2: The Knowledge Argument
      3. Objection 3: Mysterianism
      4. Objection 4: Zombies
      5. Varieties of Materialism
  4. Specific Theories of Consciousness
    1. Neural Theories
    2. Representational Theories of Consciousness
      1. First-Order Representationalism
      2. Higher-Order Representationalism
      3. Hybrid Representational Accounts
    3. Other Cognitive Theories
    4. Quantum Approaches
  5. Consciousness and Science: Key Issues
    1. The Unity of Consciousness/The Binding Problem
    2. The Neural Correlates of Consciousness (NCCs)
    3. Philosophical Psychopathology
  6. Animal and Machine Consciousness
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Terminological Matters: Various Concepts of Consciousness

The concept of consciousness is notoriously ambiguous. It is important first to make several distinctions and to define related terms. The abstract noun “consciousness” is not often used in the contemporary literature, though it should be noted that it is originally derived from the Latin con (with) and scire (to know). Thus, “consciousness” has etymological ties to one’s ability to know and perceive, and should not be confused with conscience, which has the much more specific moral connotation of knowing when one has done or is doing something wrong. Through consciousness, one can have knowledge of the external world or one’s own mental states. The primary contemporary interest lies more in the use of the expressions “x is conscious” or “x is conscious of y.” Under the former category, perhaps most important is the distinction between state and creature consciousness (Rosenthal 1993a). We sometimes speak of an individual mental state, such as a pain or perception, as conscious. On the other hand, we also often speak of organisms or creatures as conscious, such as when we say “human beings are conscious” or “dogs are conscious.” Creature consciousness is also simply meant to refer to the fact that an organism is awake, as opposed to sleeping or in a coma. However, some kind of state consciousness is often implied by creature consciousness, that is, the organism is having conscious mental states. Due to the lack of a direct object in the expression “x is conscious,” this is usually referred to as intransitive consciousness, in contrast to transitive consciousness where the locution “x is conscious of y” is used (Rosenthal 1993a, 1997). Most contemporary theories of consciousness are aimed at explaining state consciousness; that is, explaining what makes a mental state a conscious mental state.

It might seem that “conscious” is synonymous with, say, “awareness” or “experience” or “attention.” However, it is crucial to recognize that this is not generally accepted today. For example, though perhaps somewhat atypical, one might hold that there are even unconscious experiences, depending of course on how the term “experience” is defined (Carruthers 2000). More common is the belief that we can be aware of external objects in some unconscious sense, for example, during cases of subliminal perception. The expression “conscious awareness” does not therefore seem to be redundant. Finally, it is not clear that consciousness ought to be restricted to attention. It seems plausible to suppose that one is conscious (in some sense) of objects in one’s peripheral visual field even though one is only attending to some narrow (focal) set of objects within that visual field.

Perhaps the most fundamental and commonly used notion of “conscious” is captured by Thomas Nagel’s famous “what it is like” sense (Nagel 1974). When I am in a conscious mental state, there is “something it is like” for me to be in that state from the subjective or first-person point of view. When I am, for example, smelling a rose or having a conscious visual experience, there is something it “seems” or “feels” like from my perspective. An organism, such as a bat, is conscious if it is able to experience the outer world through its (echo-locatory) senses. There is also something it is like to be a conscious creature whereas there is nothing it is like to be, for example, a table or tree. This is primarily the sense of “conscious state” that will be used throughout this entry. There are still, though, a cluster of expressions and terms related to Nagel’s sense, and some authors simply stipulate the way that they use such terms. For example, philosophers sometimes refer to conscious states as phenomenal or qualitative states. More technically, philosophers often view such states as having qualitative properties called “qualia” (prounced like "kwal' ee uh"; the singular is quale). There is significant disagreement over the nature, and even the existence, of qualia, but they are perhaps most frequently understood as the felt properties or qualities of conscious states.

Ned Block (1995) makes an often cited distinction between phenomenal consciousness (or “phenomenality”) and access consciousness. The former is very much in line with the Nagelian notion described above. However, Block also defines the quite different notion of access consciousness in terms of a mental state’s relationship with other mental states; for example, a mental state’s “availability for use in reasoning and rationality guiding speech and action” (Block 1995: 227). This would, for example, count a visual perception as (access) conscious not because it has the “what it’s likeness” of phenomenal states, but rather because it carries visual information which is generally available for use by the organism, regardless of whether or not it has any qualitative properties. Access consciousness is therefore more of a functional notion; that is, concerned with what such states do. Although this concept of consciousness is certainly very important in cognitive science and philosophy of mind generally, not everyone agrees that access consciousness deserves to be called “consciousnesses” in any important sense. Block himself argues that neither sense of consciousness implies the other, while others urge that there is a more intimate connection between the two.

Finally, it is helpful to distinguish between consciousness and self-consciousness, which plausibly involves some kind of awareness or consciousness of one’s own mental states (instead of something out in the world). Self-consciousness arguably comes in degrees of sophistication ranging from minimal bodily self-awareness to the ability to reason and reflect on one’s own mental states, such as one’s beliefs and desires. Some important historical figures have even held that consciousness entails some form of self-consciousness (Kant 1781/1965, Sartre 1956), a view shared by some contemporary philosophers (Gennaro 1996a, Kriegel 2004).

2. Some History on the Topic

Interest in the nature of conscious experience has no doubt been around for as long as there have been reflective humans. It would be impossible here to survey the entire history, but a few highlights are in order. In the history of Western philosophy, which is the focus of this entry, important writings on human nature and the soul and mind go back to ancient philosophers, such as Plato. More sophisticated work on the nature of consciousness and perception can be found in the work of Plato’s most famous student Aristotle (see Caston 2002), and then throughout the later Medieval period. It is, however, with the work of René Descartes (1596-1650) and his successors in the early modern period of philosophy that consciousness and the relationship between the mind and body took center stage. As we shall see, Descartes argued that the mind is a non-physical substance distinct from the body. He also did not believe in the existence of unconscious mental states, a view certainly not widely held today. Descartes defined “thinking” very broadly to include virtually every kind of mental state and urged that consciousness is essential to thought. Our mental states are, according to Descartes, infallibly transparent to introspection. John Locke (1689/1975) held a similar position regarding the connection between mentality and consciousness, but was far less committed on the exact metaphysical nature of the mind.

Perhaps the most important philosopher of the period explicitly to endorse the existence of unconscious mental states was G.W. Leibniz (1686/1991, 1720/1925). Although Leibniz also believed in the immaterial nature of mental substances (which he called “monads”), he recognized the existence of what he called “petit perceptions,” which are basically unconscious perceptions. He also importantly distinguished between perception and apperception, roughly the difference between outer-directed consciousness and self-consciousness (see Gennaro 1999 for some discussion). The most important detailed theory of mind in the early modern period was developed by Immanuel Kant. His main work Critique of Pure Reason (1781/1965) is as equally dense as it is important, and cannot easily be summarized in this context. Although he owes a great debt to his immediate predecessors, Kant is arguably the most important philosopher since Plato and Aristotle and is highly relevant today. Kant basically thought that an adequate account of phenomenal consciousness involved far more than any of his predecessors had considered. There are important mental structures which are “presupposed” in conscious experience, and Kant presented an elaborate theory as to what those structures are, which, in turn, had other important implications. He, like Leibniz, also saw the need to postulate the existence of unconscious mental states and mechanisms in order to provide an adequate theory of mind (Kitcher 1990 and Brook 1994 are two excellent books on Kant’s theory of mind.).

Over the past one hundred years or so, however, research on consciousness has taken off in many important directions. In psychology, with the notable exception of the virtual banishment of consciousness by behaviorist psychologists (e.g., Skinner 1953), there were also those deeply interested in consciousness and various introspective (or “first-person”) methods of investigating the mind. The writings of such figures as Wilhelm Wundt (1897), William James (1890) and Alfred Titchener (1901) are good examples of this approach. Franz Brentano (1874/1973) also had a profound effect on some contemporary theories of consciousness. Similar introspectionist approaches were used by those in the so-called “phenomenological” tradition in philosophy, such as in the writings of Edmund Husserl (1913/1931, 1929/1960) and Martin Heidegger (1927/1962). The work of Sigmund Freud was very important, at minimum, in bringing about the near universal acceptance of the existence of unconscious mental states and processes.

It must, however, be kept in mind that none of the above had very much scientific knowledge about the detailed workings of the brain.  The relatively recent development of neurophysiology is, in part, also responsible for the unprecedented interdisciplinary research interest in consciousness, particularly since the 1980s.  There are now several important journals devoted entirely to the study of consciousness: Consciousness and Cognition, Journal of Consciousness Studies, and Psyche.  There are also major annual conferences sponsored by world wide professional organizations, such as the Association for the Scientific Study of Consciousness, and an entire book series called “Advances in Consciousness Research” published by John Benjamins.  (For a small sample of introductory texts and important anthologies, see Kim 1996, Gennaro 1996b, Block et. al. 1997, Seager 1999, Chalmers 2002, Baars et. al. 2003, Blackmore 2004, Campbell 2005, Velmans and Schneider 2007, Zelazo et al. 2007, Revonsuo 2010.)

3. The Metaphysics of Consciousness: Materialism vs. Dualism

Metaphysics is the branch of philosophy concerned with the ultimate nature of reality. There are two broad traditional and competing metaphysical views concerning the nature of the mind and conscious mental states: dualism and materialism. While there are many versions of each, the former generally holds that the conscious mind or a conscious mental state is non-physical in some sense. On the other hand, materialists hold that the mind is the brain, or, more accurately, that conscious mental activity is identical with neural activity. It is important to recognize that by non-physical, dualists do not merely mean “not visible to the naked eye.” Many physical things fit this description, such as the atoms which make up the air in a typical room. For something to be non-physical, it must literally be outside the realm of physics; that is, not in space at all and undetectable in principle by the instruments of physics. It is equally important to recognize that the category “physical” is broader than the category “material.” Materialists are called such because there is the tendency to view the brain, a material thing, as the most likely physical candidate to identify with the mind. However, something might be physical but not material in this sense, such as an electromagnetic or energy field. One might therefore instead be a “physicalist” in some broader sense and still not a dualist. Thus, to say that the mind is non-physical is to say something much stronger than that it is non-material. Dualists, then, tend to believe that conscious mental states or minds are radically different from anything in the physical world at all.

a. Dualism: General Support and Related Issues

There are a number of reasons why some version of dualism has been held throughout the centuries. For one thing, especially from the introspective or first-person perspective, our conscious mental states just do not seem like physical things or processes. That is, when we reflect on our conscious perceptions, pains, and desires, they do not seem to be physical in any sense. Consciousness seems to be a unique aspect of the world not to be understood in any physical way. Although materialists will urge that this completely ignores the more scientific third-person perspective on the nature of consciousness and mind, this idea continues to have force for many today. Indeed, it is arguably the crucial underlying intuition behind historically significant “conceivability arguments” against materialism and for dualism. Such arguments typically reason from the premise that one can conceive of one’s conscious states existing without one’s body or, conversely, that one can imagine one’s own physical duplicate without consciousness at all (see section 3b.iv). The metaphysical conclusion ultimately drawn is that consciousness cannot be identical with anything physical, partly because there is no essential conceptual connection between the mental and the physical. Arguments such as these go back to Descartes and continue to be used today in various ways (Kripke 1972, Chalmers 1996), but it is highly controversial as to whether they succeed in showing that materialism is false. Materialists have replied in various ways to such arguments and the relevant literature has grown dramatically in recent years.

Historically, there is also the clear link between dualism and a belief in immortality, and hence a more theistic perspective than one tends to find among materialists. Indeed, belief in dualism is often explicitly theologically motivated. If the conscious mind is not physical, it seems more plausible to believe in the possibility of life after bodily death. On the other hand, if conscious mental activity is identical with brain activity, then it would seem that when all brain activity ceases, so do all conscious experiences and thus no immortality. After all, what do many people believe continues after bodily death? Presumably, one’s own conscious thoughts, memories, experiences, beliefs, and so on. There is perhaps a similar historical connection to a belief in free will, which is of course a major topic in its own right. For our purposes, it suffices to say that, on some definitions of what it is to act freely, such ability seems almost “supernatural” in the sense that one’s conscious decisions can alter the otherwise deterministic sequence of events in nature. To put it another way: If we are entirely physical beings as the materialist holds, then mustn’t all of the brain activity and behavior in question be determined by the laws of nature? Although materialism may not logically rule out immortality or free will, materialists will likely often reply that such traditional, perhaps even outdated or pre-scientific beliefs simply ought to be rejected to the extent that they conflict with materialism. After all, if the weight of the evidence points toward materialism and away from dualism, then so much the worse for those related views.

One might wonder “even if the mind is physical, what about the soul?” Maybe it’s the soul, not the mind, which is non-physical as one might be told in many religious traditions. While it is true that the term “soul” (or “spirit”) is often used instead of “mind” in such religious contexts, the problem is that it is unclear just how the soul is supposed to differ from the mind. The terms are often even used interchangeably in many historical texts and by many philosophers because it is unclear what else the soul could be other than “the mental substance.” It is difficult to describe the soul in any way that doesn’t make it sound like what we mean by the mind. After all, that’s what many believe goes on after bodily death; namely, conscious mental activity. Granted that the term “soul” carries a more theological connotation, but it doesn’t follow that the words “soul” and “mind” refer to entirely different things. Somewhat related to the issue of immortality, the existence of near death experiences is also used as some evidence for dualism and immortality. Such patients experience a peaceful moving toward a light through a tunnel like structure, or are able to see doctors working on their bodies while hovering over them in an emergency room (sometimes akin to what is called an “out of body experience”). In response, materialists will point out that such experiences can be artificially induced in various experimental situations, and that starving the brain of oxygen is known to cause hallucinations.

Various paranormal and psychic phenomena, such as clairvoyance, faith healing, and mind-reading, are sometimes also cited as evidence for dualism. However, materialists (and even many dualists) will first likely wish to be skeptical of the alleged phenomena themselves for numerous reasons. There are many modern day charlatans who should make us seriously question whether there really are such phenomena or mental abilities in the first place. Second, it is not quite clear just how dualism follows from such phenomena even if they are genuine. A materialist, or physicalist at least, might insist that though such phenomena are puzzling and perhaps currently difficult to explain in physical terms, they are nonetheless ultimately physical in nature; for example, having to do with very unusual transfers of energy in the physical world. The dualist advantage is perhaps not as obvious as one might think, and we need not jump to supernatural conclusions so quickly.

i. Substance Dualism and Objections

Interactionist Dualism or simply “interactionism” is the most common form of “substance dualism” and its name derives from the widely accepted fact that mental states and bodily states causally interact with each other. For example, my desire to drink something cold causes my body to move to the refrigerator and get something to drink and, conversely, kicking me in the shin will cause me to feel a pain and get angry. Due to Descartes’ influence, it is also sometimes referred to as “Cartesian dualism.” Knowing nothing about just where such causal interaction could take place, Descartes speculated that it was through the pineal gland, a now almost humorous conjecture. But a modern day interactionist would certainly wish to treat various areas of the brain as the location of such interactions.

Three serious objections are briefly worth noting here. The first is simply the issue of just how does or could such radically different substances causally interact. How something non-physical causally interacts with something physical, such as the brain? No such explanation is forthcoming or is perhaps even possible, according to materialists. Moreover, if causation involves a transfer of energy from cause to effect, then how is that possible if the mind is really non-physical? Gilbert Ryle (1949) mockingly calls the Cartesian view about the nature of mind, a belief in the “ghost in the machine.” Secondly, assuming that some such energy transfer makes any sense at all, it is also then often alleged that interactionism is inconsistent with the scientifically well-established Conservation of Energy principle, which says that the total amount of energy in the universe, or any controlled part of it, remains constant. So any loss of energy in the cause must be passed along as a corresponding gain of energy in the effect, as in standard billiard ball examples. But if interactionism is true, then when mental events cause physical events, energy would literally come into the physical word. On the other hand, when bodily events cause mental events, energy would literally go out of the physical world. At the least, there is a very peculiar and unique notion of energy involved, unless one wished, even more radically, to deny the conservation principle itself. Third, some materialists might also use the well-known fact that brain damage (even to very specific areas of the brain) causes mental defects as a serious objection to interactionism (and thus as support for materialism). This has of course been known for many centuries, but the level of detailed knowledge has increased dramatically in recent years. Now a dualist might reply that such phenomena do not absolutely refute her metaphysical position since it could be replied that damage to the brain simply causes corresponding damage to the mind. However, this raises a host of other questions: Why not opt for the simpler explanation, i.e., that brain damage causes mental damage because mental processes simply are brain processes? If the non-physical mind is damaged when brain damage occurs, how does that leave one’s mind according to the dualist’s conception of an afterlife? Will the severe amnesic at the end of life on Earth retain such a deficit in the afterlife? If proper mental functioning still depends on proper brain functioning, then is dualism really in no better position to offer hope for immortality?

It should be noted that there is also another less popular form of substance dualism called parallelism, which denies the causal interaction between the non-physical mental and physical bodily realms. It seems fair to say that it encounters even more serious objections than interactionism.

ii. Other Forms of Dualism

While a detailed survey of all varieties of dualism is beyond the scope of this entry, it is at least important to note here that the main and most popular form of dualism today is called property dualism. Substance dualism has largely fallen out of favor at least in most philosophical circles, though there are important exceptions (e.g., Swinburne 1986, Foster 1996) and it often continues to be tied to various theological positions. Property dualism, on the other hand, is a more modest version of dualism and it holds that there are mental properties (that is, characteristics or aspects of things) that are neither identical with nor reducible to physical properties. There are actually several different kinds of property dualism, but what they have in common is the idea that conscious properties, such as the color qualia involved in a conscious experience of a visual perception, cannot be explained in purely physical terms and, thus, are not themselves to be identified with any brain state or process.

Two other views worth mentioning are epiphenomenalism and panpsychism. The latter is the somewhat eccentric view that all things in physical reality, even down to micro-particles, have some mental properties. All substances have a mental aspect, though it is not always clear exactly how to characterize or test such a claim. Epiphenomenalism holds that mental events are caused by brain events but those mental events are mere “epiphenomena” which do not, in turn, cause anything physical at all, despite appearances to the contrary (for a recent defense, see Robinson 2004).

Finally, although not a form of dualism, idealism holds that there are only immaterial mental substances, a view more common in the Eastern tradition. The most prominent Western proponent of idealism was 18th century empiricist George Berkeley. The idealist agrees with the substance dualist, however, that minds are non-physical, but then denies the existence of mind-independent physical substances altogether. Such a view faces a number of serious objections, and it also requires a belief in the existence of God.

b. Materialism: General Support

Some form of materialism is probably much more widely held today than in centuries past. No doubt part of the reason for this has to do with the explosion in scientific knowledge about the workings of the brain and its intimate connection with consciousness, including the close connection between brain damage and various states of consciousness. Brain death is now the main criterion for when someone dies. Stimulation to specific areas of the brain results in modality specific conscious experiences. Indeed, materialism often seems to be a working assumption in neurophysiology. Imagine saying to a neuroscientist “you are not really studying the conscious mind itself” when she is examining the workings of the brain during an fMRI. The idea is that science is showing us that conscious mental states, such as visual perceptions, are simply identical with certain neuro-chemical brain processes; much like the science of chemistry taught us that water just is H2O.

There are also theoretical factors on the side of materialism, such as adherence to the so-called “principle of simplicity” which says that if two theories can equally explain a given phenomenon, then we should accept the one which posits fewer objects or forces. In this case, even if dualism could equally explain consciousness (which would of course be disputed by materialists), materialism is clearly the simpler theory in so far as it does not posit any objects or processes over and above physical ones. Materialists will wonder why there is a need to believe in the existence of such mysterious non-physical entities. Moreover, in the aftermath of the Darwinian revolution, it would seem that materialism is on even stronger ground provided that one accepts basic evolutionary theory and the notion that most animals are conscious. Given the similarities between the more primitive parts of the human brain and the brains of other animals, it seems most natural to conclude that, through evolution, increasing layers of brain areas correspond to increased mental abilities. For example, having a well developed prefrontal cortex allows humans to reason and plan in ways not available to dogs and cats. It also seems fairly uncontroversial to hold that we should be materialists about the minds of animals. If so, then it would be odd indeed to hold that non-physical conscious states suddenly appear on the scene with humans.

There are still, however, a number of much discussed and important objections to materialism, most of which question the notion that materialism can adequately explain conscious experience.

i. Objection 1: The Explanatory Gap and The Hard Problem

Joseph Levine (1983) coined the expression “the explanatory gap” to express a difficulty for any materialistic attempt to explain consciousness. Although not concerned to reject the metaphysics of materialism, Levine gives eloquent expression to the idea that there is a key gap in our ability to explain the connection between phenomenal properties and brain properties (see also Levine 1993, 2001). The basic problem is that it is, at least at present, very difficult for us to understand the relationship between brain properties and phenomenal properties in any explanatory satisfying way, especially given the fact that it seems possible for one to be present without the other. There is an odd kind of arbitrariness involved: Why or how does some particular brain process produce that particular taste or visual sensation? It is difficult to see any real explanatory connection between specific conscious states and brain states in a way that explains just how or why the former are identical with the latter. There is therefore an explanatory gap between the physical and mental. Levine argues that this difficulty in explaining consciousness is unique; that is, we do not have similar worries about other scientific identities, such as that “water is H2O” or that “heat is mean molecular kinetic energy.” There is “an important sense in which we can’t really understand how [materialism] could be true.” (2001: 68)

David Chalmers (1995) has articulated a similar worry by using the catchy phrase “the hard problem of consciousness,” which basically refers to the difficulty of explaining just how physical processes in the brain give rise to subjective conscious experiences. The “really hard problem is the problem of experience…How can we explain why there is something it is like to entertain a mental image, or to experience an emotion?” (1995: 201) Others have made similar points, as Chalmers acknowledges, but reference to the phrase “the hard problem” has now become commonplace in the literature. Unlike Levine, however, Chalmers is much more inclined to draw anti-materialist metaphysical conclusions from these and other considerations. Chalmers usefully distinguishes the hard problem of consciousness from what he calls the (relatively) “easy problems” of consciousness, such as the ability to discriminate and categorize stimuli, the ability of a cognitive system to access its own internal states, and the difference between wakefulness and sleep. The easy problems generally have more to do with the functions of consciousness, but Chalmers urges that solving them does not touch the hard problem of phenomenal consciousness. Most philosophers, according to Chalmers, are really only addressing the easy problems, perhaps merely with something like Block’s “access consciousness” in mind. Their theories ignore phenomenal consciousness.

There are many responses by materialists to the above charges, but it is worth emphasizing that Levine, at least, does not reject the metaphysics of materialism. Instead, he sees the “explanatory gap [as] primarily an epistemological problem” (2001: 10). That is, it is primarily a problem having to do with knowledge or understanding. This concession is still important at least to the extent that one is concerned with the larger related metaphysical issues discussed in section 3a, such as the possibility of immortality.

Perhaps most important for the materialist, however, is recognition of the fact that different concepts can pick out the same property or object in the world (Loar 1990, 1997). Out in the world there is only the one “stuff,” which we can conceptualize either as “water” or as “H2O.” The traditional distinction, made most notably by Gottlob Frege in the late 19th century, between “meaning” (or “sense”) and “reference” is also relevant here. Two or more concepts, which can have different meanings, can refer to the same property or object, much like “Venus” and “The Morning Star.” Materialists, then, explain that it is essential to distinguish between mental properties and our concepts of those properties. By analogy, there are so-called “phenomenal concepts” which uses a phenomenal or “first-person” property to refer to some conscious mental state, such as a sensation of red (Alter and Walter 2007). In contrast, we can also use various concepts couched in physical or neurophysiological terms to refer to that same mental state from the third-person point of view. There is thus but one conscious mental state which can be conceptualized in two different ways: either by employing first-person experiential phenomenal concepts or by employing third-person neurophysiological concepts. It may then just be a “brute fact” about the world that there are such identities and the appearance of arbitrariness between brain properties and mental properties is just that – an apparent problem leading many to wonder about the alleged explanatory gap. Qualia would then still be identical to physical properties. Moreover, this response provides a diagnosis for why there even seems to be such a gap; namely, that we use very different concepts to pick out the same property. Science will be able, in principle, to close the gap and solve the hard problem of consciousness in an analogous way that we now have a very good understanding for why “water is H2O” or “heat is mean molecular kinetic energy” that was lacking centuries ago. Maybe the hard problem isn’t so hard after all – it will just take some more time. After all, the science of chemistry didn’t develop overnight and we are relatively early in the history of neurophysiology and our understanding of phenomenal consciousness. (See Shear 1997 for many more specific responses to the hard problem, but also for Chalmers’ counter-replies.)

ii. Objection 2: The Knowledge Argument

There is a pair of very widely discussed, and arguably related, objections to materialism which come from the seminal writings of Thomas Nagel (1974) and Frank Jackson (1982, 1986). These arguments, especially Jackson’s, have come to be known as examples of the “knowledge argument” against materialism, due to their clear emphasis on the epistemological (that is, knowledge related) limitations of materialism. Like Levine, Nagel does not reject the metaphysics of materialism. Jackson had originally intended for his argument to yield a dualistic conclusion, but he no longer holds that view. The general pattern of each argument is to assume that all the physical facts are known about some conscious mind or conscious experience. Yet, the argument goes, not all is known about the mind or experience. It is then inferred that the missing knowledge is non-physical in some sense, which is surely an anti-materialist conclusion in some sense.

Nagel imagines a future where we know everything physical there is to know about some other conscious creature’s mind, such as a bat. However, it seems clear that we would still not know something crucial; namely, “what it is like to be a bat.” It will not do to imagine what it is like for us to be a bat. We would still not know what it is like to be a bat from the bat’s subjective or first-person point of view. The idea, then, is that if we accept the hypothesis that we know all of the physical facts about bat minds, and yet some knowledge about bat minds is left out, then materialism is inherently flawed when it comes to explaining consciousness. Even in an ideal future in which everything physical is known by us, something would still be left out. Jackson’s somewhat similar, but no less influential, argument begins by asking us to imagine a future where a person, Mary, is kept in a black and white room from birth during which time she becomes a brilliant neuroscientist and an expert on color perception. Mary never sees red for example, but she learns all of the physical facts and everything neurophysiologically about human color vision. Eventually she is released from the room and sees red for the first time. Jackson argues that it is clear that Mary comes to learn something new; namely, to use Nagel’s famous phrase, what it is like to experience red. This is a new piece of knowledge and hence she must have come to know some non-physical fact (since, by hypothesis, she already knew all of the physical facts). Thus, not all knowledge about the conscious mind is physical knowledge.

The influence and the quantity of work that these ideas have generated cannot be exaggerated. Numerous materialist responses to Nagel’s argument have been presented (such as Van Gulick 1985), and there is now a very useful anthology devoted entirely to Jackson’s knowledge argument (Ludlow et. al. 2004). Some materialists have wondered if we should concede up front that Mary wouldn’t be able to imagine the color red even before leaving the room, so that maybe she wouldn’t even be surprised upon seeing red for the first time. Various suspicions about the nature and effectiveness of such thought experiments also usually accompany this response. More commonly, however, materialists reply by arguing that Mary does not learn a new fact when seeing red for the first time, but rather learns the same fact in a different way. Recalling the distinction made in section 3b.i between concepts and objects or properties, the materialist will urge that there is only the one physical fact about color vision, but there are two ways to come to know it: either by employing neurophysiological concepts or by actually undergoing the relevant experience and so by employing phenomenal concepts. We might say that Mary, upon leaving the black and white room, becomes acquainted with the same neural property as before, but only now from the first-person point of view. The property itself isn’t new; only the perspective, or what philosophers sometimes call the “mode of presentation,” is different. In short, coming to learn or know something new does not entail learning some new fact about the world. Analogies are again given in other less controversial areas, for example, one can come to know about some historical fact or event by reading a (reliable) third-person historical account or by having observed that event oneself. But there is still only the one objective fact under two different descriptions. Finally, it is crucial to remember that, according to most, the metaphysics of materialism remains unaffected. Drawing a metaphysical conclusion from such purely epistemological premises is always a questionable practice. Nagel’s argument doesn’t show that bat mental states are not identical with bat brain states. Indeed, a materialist might even expect the conclusion that Nagel draws; after all, given that our brains are so different from bat brains, it almost seems natural for there to be certain aspects of bat experience that we could never fully comprehend. Only the bat actually undergoes the relevant brain processes. Similarly, Jackson’s argument doesn’t show that Mary’s color experience is distinct from her brain processes.

Despite the plethora of materialist responses, vigorous debate continues as there are those who still think that something profound must always be missing from any materialist attempt to explain consciousness; namely, that understanding subjective phenomenal consciousness is an inherently first-person activity which cannot be captured by any objective third-person scientific means, no matter how much scientific knowledge is accumulated. Some knowledge about consciousness is essentially limited to first-person knowledge. Such a sense, no doubt, continues to fuel the related anti-materialist intuitions raised in the previous section. Perhaps consciousness is simply a fundamental or irreducible part of nature in some sense (Chalmers 1996). (For more see Van Gulick 1993.)

iii. Objection 3: Mysterianism

Finally, some go so far as to argue that we are simply not capable of solving the problem of consciousness (McGinn 1989, 1991, 1995). In short, “mysterians” believe that the hard problem can never be solved because of human cognitive limitations; the explanatory gap can never be filled. Once again, however, McGinn does not reject the metaphysics of materialism, but rather argues that we are “cognitively closed” with respect to this problem much like a rat or dog is cognitively incapable of solving, or even understanding, calculus problems. More specifically, McGinn claims that we are cognitively closed as to how the brain produces conscious awareness. McGinn concedes that some brain property produces conscious experience, but we cannot understand how this is so or even know what that brain property is. Our concept forming mechanisms simply will not allow us to grasp the physical and causal basis of consciousness. We are not conceptually suited to be able to do so.

McGinn does not entirely rest his argument on past failed attempts at explaining consciousness in materialist terms; instead, he presents another argument for his admittedly pessimistic conclusion. McGinn observes that we do not have a mental faculty that can access both consciousness and the brain. We access consciousness through introspection or the first-person perspective, but our access to the brain is through the use of outer spatial senses (e.g., vision) or a more third-person perspective. Thus we have no way to access both the brain and consciousness together, and therefore any explanatory link between them is forever beyond our reach.

Materialist responses are numerous. First, one might wonder why we can’t combine the two perspectives within certain experimental contexts. Both first-person and third-person scientific data about the brain and consciousness can be acquired and used to solve the hard problem. Even if a single person cannot grasp consciousness from both perspectives at the same time, why can’t a plausible physicalist theory emerge from such a combined approach? Presumably, McGinn would say that we are not capable of putting such a theory together in any appropriate way. Second, despite McGinn’s protests to the contrary, many will view the problem of explaining consciousness as a merely temporary limit of our theorizing, and not something which is unsolvable in principle (Dennett 1991). Third, it may be that McGinn expects too much; namely, grasping some causal link between the brain and consciousness. After all, if conscious mental states are simply identical to brain states, then there may simply be a “brute fact” that really does not need any further explaining. Indeed, this is sometimes also said in response to the explanatory gap and the hard problem, as we saw earlier. It may even be that some form of dualism is presupposed in McGinn’s argument, to the extent that brain states are said to “cause” or “give rise to” consciousness, instead of using the language of identity. Fourth, McGinn’s analogy to lower animals and mathematics is not quite accurate. Rats, for example, have no concept whatsoever of calculus. It is not as if they can grasp it to some extent but just haven’t figured out the answer to some particular problem within mathematics. Rats are just completely oblivious to calculus problems. On the other hand, we humans obviously do have some grasp on consciousness and on the workings of the brain -- just see the references at the end of this entry! It is not clear, then, why we should accept the extremely pessimistic and universally negative conclusion that we can never discover the answer to the problem of consciousness, or, more specifically, why we could never understand the link between consciousness and the brain.

iv. Objection 4: Zombies

Unlike many of the above objections to materialism, the appeal to the possibility of zombies is often taken as both a problem for materialism and as a more positive argument for some form of dualism, such as property dualism. The philosophical notion of a “zombie” basically refers to conceivable creatures which are physically indistinguishable from us but lack consciousness entirely (Chalmers 1996). It certainly seems logically possible for there to be such creatures: “the conceivability of zombies seems…obvious to me…While this possibility is probably empirically impossible, it certainly seems that a coherent situation is described; I can discern no contradiction in the description” (Chalmers 1996: 96). Philosophers often contrast what is logically possible (in the sense of “that which is not self-contradictory”) from what is empirically possible given the actual laws of nature. Thus, it is logically possible for me to jump fifty feet in the air, but not empirically possible. Philosophers often use the notion of “possible worlds,” i.e., different ways that the world might have been, in describing such non-actual situations or possibilities. The objection, then, typically proceeds from such a possibility to the conclusion that materialism is false because materialism would seem to rule out that possibility. It has been fairly widely accepted (since Kripke 1972) that all identity statements are necessarily true (that is, true in all possible worlds), and the same should therefore go for mind-brain identity claims. Since the possibility of zombies shows that it doesn’t, then we should conclude that materialism is false. (See Identity Theory.)

It is impossible to do justice to all of the subtleties here. The literature in response to zombie, and related “conceivability,” arguments is enormous (see, for example, Hill 1997, Hill and McLaughlin 1999, Papineau 1998, 2002, Balog 1999, Block and Stalnaker 1999, Loar 1999, Yablo 1999, Perry 2001, Botterell 2001, Kirk 2005). A few lines of reply are as follows: First, it is sometimes objected that the conceivability of something does not really entail its possibility. Perhaps we can also conceive of water not being H2O, since there seems to be no logical contradiction in doing so, but, according to received wisdom from Kripke, that is really impossible. Perhaps, then, some things just seem possible but really aren’t. Much of the debate centers on various alleged similarities or dissimilarities between the mind-brain and water-H2O cases (or other such scientific identities). Indeed, the entire issue of the exact relationship between “conceivability” and “possibility” is the subject of an important recently published anthology (Gendler and Hawthorne 2002). Second, even if zombies are conceivable in the sense of logically possible, how can we draw a substantial metaphysical conclusion about the actual world? There is often suspicion on the part of materialists about what, if anything, such philosophers’ “thought experiments” can teach us about the nature of our minds. It seems that one could take virtually any philosophical or scientific theory about almost anything, conceive that it is possibly false, and then conclude that it is actually false. Something, perhaps, is generally wrong with this way of reasoning. Third, as we saw earlier (3b.i), there may be a very good reason why such zombie scenarios seem possible; namely, that we do not (at least, not yet) see what the necessary connection is between neural events and conscious mental events. On the one side, we are dealing with scientific third-person concepts and, on the other, we are employing phenomenal concepts. We are, perhaps, simply currently not in a position to understand completely such a necessary connection.

Debate and discussion on all four objections remains very active.

v. Varieties of Materialism

Despite the apparent simplicity of materialism, say, in terms of the identity between mental states and neural states, the fact is that there are many different forms of materialism. While a detailed survey of all varieties is beyond the scope of this entry, it is at least important to acknowledge the commonly drawn distinction between two kinds of “identity theory”: token-token and type-type materialism. Type-type identity theory is the stronger thesis and says that mental properties, such as “having a desire to drink some water” or “being in pain,” are literally identical with a brain property of some kind. Such identities were originally meant to be understood as on a par with, for example, the scientific identity between “being water” and “being composed of H2O” (Place 1956, Smart 1959). However, this view historically came under serious assault due to the fact that it seems to rule out the so-called “multiple realizability” of conscious mental states. The idea is simply that it seems perfectly possible for there to be other conscious beings (e.g., aliens, radically different animals) who can have those same mental states but who also are radically different from us physiologically (Fodor 1974). It seems that commitment to type-type identity theory led to the undesirable result that only organisms with brains like ours can have conscious states. Somewhat more technically, most materialists wish to leave room for the possibility that mental properties can be “instantiated” in different kinds of organisms. (But for more recent defenses of type-type identity theory see Hill and McLaughlin 1999, Papineau 1994, 1995, 1998, Polger 2004.) As a consequence, a more modest “token-token” identity theory has become preferable to many materialists. This view simply holds that each particular conscious mental event in some organism is identical with some particular brain process or event in that organism. This seems to preserve much of what the materialist wants but yet allows for the multiple realizability of conscious states, because both the human and the alien can still have a conscious desire for something to drink while each mental event is identical with a (different) physical state in each organism.

Taking the notion of multiple realizability very seriously has also led many to embrace functionalism, which is the view that conscious mental states should really only be identified with the functional role they play within an organism. For example, conscious pains are defined more in terms of input and output, such as causing bodily damage and avoidance behavior, as well as in terms of their relationship to other mental states. It is normally viewed as a form of materialism since virtually all functionalists also believe, like the token-token theorist, that something physical ultimately realizes that functional state in the organism, but functionalism does not, by itself, entail that materialism is true. Critics of functionalism, however, have long argued that such purely functional accounts cannot adequately explain the essential “feel” of conscious states, or that it seems possible to have two functionally equivalent creatures, one of whom lacks qualia entirely (Block 1980a, 1980b, Chalmers 1996; see also Shoemaker 1975, 1981).

Some materialists even deny the very existence of mind and mental states altogether, at least in the sense that the very concept of consciousness is muddled (Wilkes 1984, 1988) or that the mentalistic notions found in folk psychology, such as desires and beliefs, will eventually be eliminated and replaced by physicalistic terms as neurophysiology matures into the future (Churchland 1983). This is meant as analogous to past similar eliminations based on deeper scientific understanding, for example, we no longer need to speak of “ether” or “phlogiston.” Other eliminativists, more modestly, argue that there is no such thing as qualia when they are defined in certain problematic ways (Dennett 1988).

Finally, it should also be noted that not all materialists believe that conscious mentality can be explained in terms of the physical, at least in the sense that the former cannot be “reduced” to the latter. Materialism is true as an ontological or metaphysical doctrine, but facts about the mind cannot be deduced from facts about the physical world (Boyd 1980, Van Gulick 1992). In some ways, this might be viewed as a relatively harmless variation on materialist themes, but others object to the very coherence of this form of materialism (Kim 1987, 1998). Indeed, the line between such “non-reductive materialism” and property dualism is not always so easy to draw; partly because the entire notion of “reduction” is ambiguous and a very complex topic in its own right. On a related front, some materialists are happy enough to talk about a somewhat weaker “supervenience” relation between mind and matter. Although “supervenience” is a highly technical notion with many variations, the idea is basically one of dependence (instead of identity); for example, that the mental depends on the physical in the sense that any mental change must be accompanied by some physical change (see Kim 1993).

4. Specific Theories of Consciousness

Most specific theories of consciousness tend to be reductionist in some sense. The classic notion at work is that consciousness or individual conscious mental states can be explained in terms of something else or in some other terms. This section will focus on several prominent contemporary reductionist theories. We should, however, distinguish between those who attempt such a reduction directly in physicalistic, such as neurophysiological, terms and those who do so in mentalistic terms, such as by using unconscious mental states or other cognitive notions.

a. Neural Theories

The more direct reductionist approach can be seen in various, more specific, neural theories of consciousness. Perhaps best known is the theory offered by Francis Crick and Christof Koch 1990 (see also Crick 1994, Koch 2004). The basic idea is that mental states become conscious when large numbers of neurons fire in synchrony and all have oscillations within the 35-75 hertz range (that is, 35-75 cycles per second). However, many philosophers and scientists have put forth other candidates for what, specifically, to identify in the brain with consciousness. This vast enterprise has come to be known as the search for the “neural correlates of consciousness” or NCCs (see section 5b below for more). The overall idea is to show how one or more specific kinds of neuro-chemical activity can underlie and explain conscious mental activity (Metzinger 2000). Of course, mere “correlation” is not enough for a fully adequate neural theory and explaining just what counts as a NCC turns out to be more difficult than one might think (Chalmers 2000). Even Crick and Koch have acknowledged that they, at best, provide a necessary condition for consciousness, and that such firing patters are not automatically sufficient for having conscious experience.

b. Representational Theories of Consciousness

Many current theories attempt to reduce consciousness in mentalistic terms. One broadly popular approach along these lines is to reduce consciousness to “mental representations” of some kind. The notion of a “representation” is of course very general and can be applied to photographs, signs, and various natural objects, such as the rings inside a tree. Much of what goes on in the brain, however, might also be understood in a representational way; for example, as mental events representing outer objects partly because they are caused by such objects in, say, cases of veridical visual perception. More specifically, philosophers will often call such representational mental states “intentional states” which have representational content; that is, mental states which are “about something” or “directed at something” as when one has a thought about the house or a perception of the tree. Although intentional states are sometimes contrasted with phenomenal states, such as pains and color experiences, it is clear that many conscious states have both phenomenal and intentional properties, such as visual perceptions. It should be noted that the relation between intentionalilty and consciousness is itself a major ongoing area of dispute with some arguing that genuine intentionality actually presupposes consciousness in some way (Searle 1992, Siewart 1998, Horgan and Tienson 2002) while most representationalists insist that intentionality is prior to consciousness (Gennaro 2012, chapter two).

The general view that we can explain conscious mental states in terms of representational or intentional states is called “representationalism.” Although not automatically reductionist in spirit, most versions of representationalism do indeed attempt such a reduction. Most representationalists, then, believe that there is room for a kind of “second-step” reduction to be filled in later by neuroscience. The other related motivation for representational theories of consciousness is that many believe that an account of representation or intentionality can more easily be given in naturalistic terms, such as causal theories whereby mental states are understood as representing outer objects in virtue of some reliable causal connection. The idea, then, is that if consciousness can be explained in representational terms and representation can be understood in purely physical terms, then there is the promise of a reductionist and naturalistic theory of consciousness. Most generally, however, we can say that a representationalist will typically hold that the phenomenal properties of experience (that is, the “qualia” or “what it is like of experience” or “phenomenal character”) can be explained in terms of the experiences’ representational properties. Alternatively, conscious mental states have no mental properties other than their representational properties. Two conscious states with all the same representational properties will not differ phenomenally. For example, when I look at the blue sky, what it is like for me to have a conscious experience of the sky is simply identical with my experience’s representation of the blue sky.

i. First-Order Representationalism

A First-order representational (FOR) theory of consciousness is a theory that attempts to explain conscious experience primarily in terms of world-directed (or first-order) intentional states. Probably the two most cited FOR theories of consciousness are those of Fred Dretske (1995) and Michael Tye (1995, 2000), though there are many others as well (e.g., Harman 1990, Kirk 1994, Byrne 2001, Thau 2002, Droege 2003). Tye’s theory is more fully worked out and so will be the focus of this section. Like other FOR theorists, Tye holds that the representational content of my conscious experience (that is, what my experience is about or directed at) is identical with the phenomenal properties of experience. Aside from reductionistic motivations, Tye and other FOR representationalists often use the somewhat technical notion of the “transparency of experience” as support for their view (Harman 1990). This is an argument based on the phenomenological first-person observation, which goes back to Moore (1903), that when one turns one’s attention away from, say, the blue sky and onto one’s experience itself, one is still only aware of the blueness of the sky. The experience itself is not blue; rather, one “sees right through” one’s experience to its representational properties, and there is nothing else to one’s experience over and above such properties.

Whatever the merits and exact nature of the argument from transparency (see Kind 2003), it is clear, of course, that not all mental representations are conscious, so the key question eventually becomes: What exactly distinguishes conscious from unconscious mental states (or representations)? What makes a mental state a conscious mental state? Here Tye defends what he calls “PANIC theory.” The acronym “PANIC” stands for poised, abstract, non-conceptual, intentional content. Without probing into every aspect of PANIC theory, Tye holds that at least some of the representational content in question is non-conceptual (N), which is to say that the subject can lack the concept for the properties represented by the experience in question, such as an experience of a certain shade of red that one has never seen before. Actually, the exact nature or even existence of non-conceptual content of experience is itself a highly debated and difficult issue in philosophy of mind (Gunther 2003).  Gennaro (2012), for example, defends conceptualism and connects it in various ways to the higher-order thought theory of consciousness (see section 4b.ii). Conscious states clearly must also have “intentional content” (IC) for any representationalist. Tye also asserts that such content is “abstract” (A) and not necessarily about particular concrete objects. This condition is needed to handle cases of hallucinations, where there are no concrete objects at all or cases where different objects look phenomenally alike. Perhaps most important for mental states to be conscious, however, is that such content must be “poised” (P), which is an importantly functional notion. The “key idea is that experiences and feelings...stand ready and available to make a direct impact on beliefs and/or desires. For example…feeling hungry… has an immediate cognitive effect, namely, the desire to eat….States with nonconceptual content that are not so poised lack phenomenal character [because]…they arise too early, as it were, in the information processing” (Tye 2000: 62).

One objection to Tye’s theory is that it does not really address the hard problem of phenomenal consciousness (see section 3b.i). This is partly because what really seems to be doing most of the work on Tye’s PANIC account is the very functional sounding “poised” notion, which is perhaps closer to Block’s access consciousness (see section 1) and is therefore not necessarily able to explain phenomenal consciousness (see Kriegel 2002). In short, it is difficult to see just how Tye’s PANIC account might not equally apply to unconscious representations and thus how it really explains phenomenal consciousness.

Other standard objections to Tye’s theory as well as to other FOR accounts include the concern that it does not cover all kinds of conscious states. Some conscious states seem not to be “about” anything, such as pains, anxiety, or after-images, and so would be non-representational conscious states. If so, then conscious experience cannot generally be explained in terms of representational properties (Block 1996). Tye responds that pains, itches, and the like do represent, in the sense that they represent parts of the body. And after-images, hallucinations, and the like either misrepresent (which is still a kind of representation) or the conscious subject still takes them to have representational properties from the first-person point of view. Indeed, Tye (2000) admirably goes to great lengths and argues convincingly in response to a whole host of alleged counter-examples to representationalism. Historically among them are various hypothetical cases of inverted qualia (see Shoemaker 1982), the mere possibility of which is sometimes taken as devastating to representationalism. These are cases where behaviorally indistinguishable individuals have inverted color perceptions of objects, such as person A visually experiences a lemon the way that person B experience a ripe tomato with respect to their color, and so on for all yellow and red objects. Isn’t it possible that there are two individuals whose color experiences are inverted with respect to the objects of perception? (For more on the importance of color in philosophy, see Hardin 1986.)

A somewhat different twist on the inverted spectrum is famously put forth in Block’s (1990) Inverted Earth case. On Inverted Earth every object has the complementary color to the one it has here, but we are asked to imagine that a person is equipped with color-inverting lenses and then sent to Inverted Earth completely ignorant of those facts. Since the color inversions cancel out, the phenomenal experiences remain the same, yet there certainly seem to be different representational properties of objects involved. The strategy on the part of critics, in short, is to think of counter-examples (either actual or hypothetical) whereby there is a difference between the phenomenal properties in experience and the relevant representational properties in the world. Such objections can, perhaps, be answered by Tye and others in various ways, but significant debate continues (Macpherson 2005). Intuitions also dramatically differ as to the very plausibility and value of such thought experiments. (For more, see Seager 1999, chapters 6 and 7. See also Chalmers 2004 for an excellent discussion of the dizzying array of possible representationalist positions.)

ii. Higher-Order Representationalism

As we have seen, one question that should be answered by any theory of consciousness is: What makes a mental state a conscious mental state? There is a long tradition that has attempted to understand consciousness in terms of some kind of higher-order awareness. For example, John Locke (1689/1975) once said that “consciousness is the perception of what passes in a man’s own mind.” This intuition has been revived by a number of philosophers (Rosenthal, 1986, 1993b, 1997, 2000, 2004, 2005; Gennaro 1996a, 2012; Armstrong, 1968, 1981; Lycan, 1996, 2001). In general, the idea is that what makes a mental state conscious is that it is the object of some kind of higher-order representation (HOR). A mental state M becomes conscious when there is a HOR of M. A HOR is a “meta-psychological” state, i.e., a mental state directed at another mental state. So, for example, my desire to write a good encyclopedia entry becomes conscious when I am (non-inferentially) “aware” of the desire. Intuitively, it seems that conscious states, as opposed to unconscious ones, are mental states that I am “aware of” in some sense. This is sometimes referred to as the Transitivity Principle. Any theory which attempts to explain consciousness in terms of higher-order states is known as a higher-order (HO) theory of consciousness. It is best initially to use the more neutral term “representation” because there are a number of different kinds of higher-order theory, depending upon how one characterizes the HOR in question. HO theories, thus, attempt to explain consciousness in mentalistic terms, that is, by reference to such notions as “thoughts” and “awareness.” Conscious mental states arise when two unconscious mental states are related in a certain specific way; namely, that one of them (the HOR) is directed at the other (M). HO theorists are united in the belief that their approach can better explain consciousness than any purely FOR theory, which has significant difficulty in explaining the difference between unconscious and conscious mental states.

There are various kinds of HO theory with the most common division between higher-order thought (HOT) theories and higher-order perception (HOP) theories. HOT theorists, such as David M. Rosenthal, think it is better to understand the HOR as a thought of some kind. HOTs are treated as cognitive states involving some kind of conceptual component. HOP theorists urge that the HOR is a perceptual or experiential state of some kind (Lycan 1996) which does not require the kind of conceptual content invoked by HOT theorists. Partly due to Kant (1781/1965), HOP theory is sometimes referred to as “inner sense theory” as a way of emphasizing its sensory or perceptual aspect. Although HOT and HOP theorists agree on the need for a HOR theory of consciousness, they do sometimes argue for the superiority of their respective positions (such as in Rosenthal 2004, Lycan 2004, and Gennaro 2012). Some philosophers, however, have argued that the difference between these theories is perhaps not as important or as clear as some think it is (Güzeldere 1995, Gennaro 1996a, Van Gulick 2000).

A common initial objection to HOR theories is that they are circular and lead to an infinite regress. It might seem that the HOT theory results in circularity by defining consciousness in terms of HOTs. It also might seem that an infinite regress results because a conscious mental state must be accompanied by a HOT, which, in turn, must be accompanied by another HOT ad infinitum. However, the standard reply is that when a conscious mental state is a first-order world-directed state the higher-order thought (HOT) is not itself conscious; otherwise, circularity and an infinite regress would follow. When the HOT is itself conscious, there is a yet higher-order (or third-order) thought directed at the second-order state. In this case, we have introspection which involves a conscious HOT directed at an inner mental state. When one introspects, one's attention is directed back into one's mind. For example, what makes my desire to write a good entry a conscious first-order desire is that there is a (non-conscious) HOT directed at the desire. In this case, my conscious focus is directed at the entry and my computer screen, so I am not consciously aware of having the HOT from the first-person point of view. When I introspect that desire, however, I then have a conscious HOT (accompanied by a yet higher, third-order, HOT) directed at the desire itself (see Rosenthal 1986).

Peter Carruthers (2000) has proposed another possibility within HO theory; namely, that it is better for various reasons to think of the HOTs as dispositional states instead of the standard view that the HOTs are actual, though he also understands his “dispositional HOT theory” to be a form of HOP theory (Carruthers 2004). The basic idea is that the conscious status of an experience is due to its availability to higher-order thought. So “conscious experience occurs when perceptual contents are fed into a special short-term buffer memory store, whose function is to make those contents available to cause HOTs about themselves.” (Carruthers 2000: 228). Some first-order perceptual contents are available to a higher-order “theory of mind mechanism,” which transforms those representational contents into conscious contents. Thus, no actual HOT occurs. Instead, according to Carruthers, some perceptual states acquire a dual intentional content; for example, a conscious experience of red not only has a first-order content of “red,” but also has the higher-order content “seems red” or “experience of red.” Carruthers also makes interesting use of so-called “consumer semantics” in order to fill out his theory of phenomenal consciousness. The content of a mental state depends, in part, on the powers of the organisms which “consume” that state, e.g., the kinds of inferences which the organism can make when it is in that state. Daniel Dennett (1991) is sometimes credited with an earlier version of a dispositional account (see Carruthers 2000, chapter ten). Carruthers’ dispositional theory is often criticized by those who, among other things, do not see how the mere disposition toward a mental state can render it conscious (Rosenthal 2004; see also Gennaro 2004, 2012; for more, see Consciousness, Higher Order Theories of.)

It is worth briefly noting a few typical objections to HO theories (many of which can be found in Byrne 1997): First, and perhaps most common, is that various animals (and even infants) are not likely to have to the conceptual sophistication required for HOTs, and so that would render animal (and infant) consciousness very unlikely (Dretske 1995, Seager 2004). Are cats and dogs capable of having complex higher-order thoughts such as “I am in mental state M”? Although most who bring forth this objection are not HO theorists, Peter Carruthers (1989) is one HO theorist who actually embraces the conclusion that (most) animals do not have phenomenal consciousness. Gennaro (1993, 1996) has replied to Carruthers on this point; for example, it is argued that the HOTs need not be as sophisticated as it might initially appear and there is ample comparative neurophysiological evidence supporting the conclusion that animals have conscious mental states. Most HO theorists do not wish to accept the absence of animal or infant consciousness as a consequence of holding the theory. The debate continues, however, in Carruthers (2000, 2005, 2008) and Gennaro (2004, 2009, 2012, chapters seven and eight).

A second objection has been referred to as the “problem of the rock” (Stubenberg 1998) and the “generality problem” (Van Gulick 2000, 2004), but it is originally due to Alvin Goldman (Goldman 1993). When I have a thought about a rock, it is certainly not true that the rock becomes conscious. So why should I suppose that a mental state becomes conscious when I think about it? This is puzzling to many and the objection forces HO theorists to explain just how adding the HO state changes an unconscious state into a conscious. There have been, however, a number of responses to this kind of objection (Rosenthal 1997, Lycan, 1996, Van Gulick 2000, 2004, Gennaro 2005, 2012, chapter four). A common theme is that there is a principled difference in the objects of the HO states in question. Rocks and the like are not mental states in the first place, and so HO theorists are first and foremost trying to explain how a mental state becomes conscious. The objects of the HO states must be “in the head.”

Third, the above leads somewhat naturally to an objection related to Chalmers’ hard problem (section 3b.i). It might be asked just how exactly any HO theory really explains the subjective or phenomenal aspect of conscious experience. How or why does a mental state come to have a first-person qualitative “what it is like” aspect by virtue of the presence of a HOR directed at it? It is probably fair to say that HO theorists have been slow to address this problem, though a number of overlapping responses have emerged (see also Gennaro 2005, 2012, chapter four, for more extensive treatment). Some argue that this objection misconstrues the main and more modest purpose of (at least, their) HO theories. The claim is that HO theories are theories of consciousness only in the sense that they are attempting to explain what differentiates conscious from unconscious states, i.e., in terms of a higher-order awareness of some kind. A full account of “qualitative properties” or “sensory qualities” (which can themselves be non-conscious) can be found elsewhere in their work, but is independent of their theory of consciousness (Rosenthal 1991, Lycan 1996, 2001). Thus, a full explanation of phenomenal consciousness does require more than a HO theory, but that is no objection to HO theories as such. Another response is that proponents of the hard problem unjustly raise the bar as to what would count as a viable explanation of consciousness so that any such reductivist attempt would inevitably fall short (Carruthers 2000, Gennaro 2012). Part of the problem, then, is a lack of clarity about what would even count as an explanation of consciousness (Van Gulick 1995; see also section 3b). Once this is clarified, however, the hard problem can indeed be solved. Moreover, anyone familiar with the literature knows that there are significant terminological difficulties in the use of various crucial terms which sometimes inhibits genuine progress (but see Byrne 2004 for some helpful clarification).

A fourth important objection to HO approaches is the question of how such theories can explain cases where the HO state might misrepresent the lower-order (LO) mental state (Byrne 1997, Neander 1998, Levine 2001, Block 2011). After all, if we have a representational relation between two states, it seems possible for misrepresentation or malfunction to occur. If it does, then what explanation can be offered by the HO theorist? If my LO state registers a red percept and my HO state registers a thought about something green due, say, to some neural misfiring, then what happens? It seems that problems loom for any answer given by a HO theorist and the cause of the problem has to do with the very nature of the HO theorist’s belief that there is a representational relation between the LO and HO states. For example, if the HO theorist takes the option that the resulting conscious experience is reddish, then it seems that the HO state plays no role in determining the qualitative character of the experience. On the other hand, if the resulting experience is greenish, then the LO state seems irrelevant.  Rosenthal and Weisberg hold that the HO state determines the qualitative properties even in cases when there is no LO state at all (Rosenthal 2005, 2011, Weisberg 2008, 2011a, 2011b).  Gennaro (2012) argues that no conscious experience results in such cases and wonders, for example, how a sole (unconscious) HOT can result in a conscious state at all.  He argues that there must be a match, complete or partial, between the LO and HO state in order for a conscious state to exist in the first place. This important objection forces HO theorists to be clearer about just how to view the relationship between the LO and HO states. Debate is ongoing and significant both on varieties of HO theory and in terms of the above objections (see Gennaro 2004a). There is also interdisciplinary interest in how various HO theories might be realized in the brain (Gennaro 2012, chapter nine).

iii. Hybrid Representational Accounts

A related and increasingly popular version of representational theory holds that the meta-psychological state in question should be understood as intrinsic to (or part of) an overall complex conscious state. This stands in contrast to the standard view that the HO state is extrinsic to (that is, entirely distinct from) its target mental state. The assumption, made by Rosenthal for example, about the extrinsic nature of the meta-thought has increasingly come under attack, and thus various hybrid representational theories can be found in the literature. One motivation for this movement is growing dissatisfaction with standard HO theory’s ability to handle some of the objections addressed in the previous section. Another reason is renewed interest in a view somewhat closer to the one held by Franz Brentano (1874/1973) and various other followers, normally associated with the phenomenological tradition (Husserl 1913/1931, 1929/1960; Sartre 1956; see also Smith 1986, 2004). To varying degrees, these views have in common the idea that conscious mental states, in some sense, represent themselves, which then still involves having a thought about a mental state, just not a distinct or separate state. Thus, when one has a conscious desire for a cold glass of water, one is also aware that one is in that very state. The conscious desire both represents the glass of water and itself. It is this “self-representing” which makes the state conscious.

These theories can go by various names, which sometimes seem in conflict, and have added significantly in recent years to the acronyms which abound in the literature. For example, Gennaro (1996a, 2002, 2004, 2006, 2012) has argued that, when one has a first-order conscious state, the HOT is better viewed as intrinsic to the target state, so that we have a complex conscious state with parts. Gennaro calls this the “wide intrinsicality view” (WIV) and he also argues that Jean-Paul Sartre’s theory of consciousness can be understood in this way (Gennaro 2002). Gennaro holds that conscious mental states should be understood (as Kant might have today) as global brain states which are combinations of passively received perceptual input and presupposed higher-order conceptual activity directed at that input. Higher-order concepts in the meta-psychological thoughts are presupposed in having first-order conscious states. Robert Van Gulick (2000, 2004, 2006) has also explored the alternative that the HO state is part of an overall global conscious state. He calls such states “HOGS” (Higher-Order Global States) whereby a lower-order unconscious state is “recruited” into a larger state, which becomes conscious partly due to the implicit self-awareness that one is in the lower-order state. Both Gennaro and Van Gulick have suggested that conscious states can be understood materialistically as global states of the brain, and it would be better to treat the first-order state as part of the larger complex brain state. This general approach is also forcefully advocated by Uriah Kriegel (Kriegel 2003a, 2003b, 2005, 2006, 2009) and is even the subject of an entire anthology debating its merits (Kriegel and Williford 2006). Kriegel has used several different names for his “neo-Brentanian theory,” such as the SOMT (Same-Order Monitoring Theory) and, more recently, the “self-representational theory of consciousness.” To be sure, the notion of a mental state representing itself or a mental state with one part representing another part is in need of further development and is perhaps somewhat mysterious. Nonetheless, there is agreement among these authors that conscious mental states are, in some important sense, reflexive or self-directed. And, once again, there is keen interest in developing this model in a way that coheres with the latest neurophysiological research on consciousness. A point of emphasis is on the concept of global meta-representation within a complex brain state, and attempts are underway to identify just how such an account can be realized in the brain.

It is worth mentioning that this idea was also briefly explored by Thomas Metzinger who focused on the fact that consciousness “is something that unifies or synthesizes experience” (Metzinger 1995: 454). Metzinger calls this the process of “higher-order binding” and thus uses the acronym HOB. Others who hold some form of the self-representational view include Kobes (1995), Caston (2002), Williford (2006), Brook and Raymont (2006), and even Carruthers’ (2000) theory can be viewed in this light since he contends that conscious states have two representational contents. Thomas Natsoulas also has a series of papers defending a similar view, beginning with Natsoulas 1996. Some authors (such as Gennaro 2012) view this hybrid position to be a modified version of HOT theory; indeed, Rosenthal (2004) has called it “intrinsic higher-order theory.” Van Gulick also clearly wishes to preserve the HO is his HOGS. Others, such as Kriegel, are not inclined to call their views “higher-order” at all and call it, for example, the “same-order monitoring” or “self-representational” theory of consciousness. To some extent, this is a terminological dispute, but, despite important similarities, there are also key subtle differences between these hybrid alternatives. Like HO theorists, however, those who advocate this general approach all take very seriously the notion that a conscious mental state M is a state that subject S is (non-inferentially) aware that S is in. By contrast, one is obviously not aware of one’s unconscious mental states. Thus, there are various attempts to make sense of and elaborate upon this key intuition in a way that is, as it were, “in-between” standard FO and HO theory. (See also Lurz 2003 and 2004 for yet another interesting hybrid account.)

c. Other Cognitive Theories

Aside from the explicitly representational approaches discussed above, there are also related attempts to explain consciousness in other cognitive terms. The two most prominent such theories are worth describing here:

Daniel Dennett (1991, 2005) has put forth what he calls the Multiple Drafts Model (MDM) of consciousness. Although similar in some ways to representationalism, Dennett is most concerned that materialists avoid falling prey to what he calls the “myth of the Cartesian theater,” the notion that there is some privileged place in the brain where everything comes together to produce conscious experience. Instead, the MDM holds that all kinds of mental activity occur in the brain by parallel processes of interpretation, all of which are under frequent revision. The MDM rejects the idea of some “self” as an inner observer; rather, the self is the product or construction of a narrative which emerges over time. Dennett is also well known for rejecting the very assumption that there is a clear line to be drawn between conscious and unconscious mental states in terms of the problematic notion of “qualia.” He influentially rejects strong emphasis on any phenomenological or first-person approach to investigating consciousness, advocating instead what he calls “heterophenomenology” according to which we should follow a more neutral path “leading from objective physical science and its insistence on the third person point of view, to a method of phenomenological description that can (in principle) do justice to the most private and ineffable subjective experiences.” (1991: 72)

Bernard Baars’ Global Workspace Theory (GWT) model of consciousness is probably the most influential theory proposed among psychologists (Baars 1988, 1997). The basic idea and metaphor is that we should think of the entire cognitive system as built on a “blackboard architecture” which is a kind of global workspace. According to GWT, unconscious processes and mental states compete for the spotlight of attention, from which information is “broadcast globally” throughout the system. Consciousness consists in such global broadcasting and is therefore also, according to Baars, an important functional and biological adaptation. We might say that consciousness is thus created by a kind of global access to select bits of information in the brain and nervous system. Despite Baars’ frequent use of “theater” and “spotlight” metaphors, he argues that his view does not entail the presence of the material Cartesian theater that Dennett is so concerned to avoid. It is, in any case, an empirical matter just how the brain performs the functions he describes, such as detecting mechanisms of attention.

Objections to these cognitive theories include the charge that they do not really address the hard problem of consciousness (as described in section 3b.i), but only the “easy” problems. Dennett is also often accused of explaining away consciousness rather than really explaining it. It is also interesting to think about Baars’ GWT in light of the Block’s distinction between access and phenomenal consciousness (see section 1). Does Baars’ theory only address access consciousness instead of the more difficult to explain phenomenal consciousness? (Two other psychological cognitive theories worth noting are the ones proposed by George Mandler 1975 and Tim Shallice 1988.)

d. Quantum Approaches

Finally, there are those who look deep beneath the neural level to the field of quantum mechanics, basically the study of sub-atomic particles, to find the key to unlocking the mysteries of consciousness. The bizarre world of quantum physics is quite different from the deterministic world of classical physics, and a major area of research in its own right. Such authors place the locus of consciousness at a very fundamental physical level. This somewhat radical, though exciting, option is explored most notably by physicist Roger Penrose (1989, 1994) and anesthesiologist Stuart Hameroff (1998). The basic idea is that consciousness arises through quantum effects which occur in subcellular neural structures known as microtubules, which are structural proteins in cell walls. There are also other quantum approaches which aim to explain the coherence of consciousness (Marshall and Zohar 1990) or use the “holistic” nature of quantum mechanics to explain consciousness (Silberstein 1998, 2001). It is difficult to assess these somewhat exotic approaches at present. Given the puzzling and often very counterintuitive nature of quantum physics, it is unclear whether such approaches will prove genuinely scientifically valuable methods in explaining consciousness. One concern is simply that these authors are trying to explain one puzzling phenomenon (consciousness) in terms of another mysterious natural phenomenon (quantum effects). Thus, the thinking seems to go, perhaps the two are essentially related somehow and other physicalistic accounts are looking in the wrong place, such as at the neuro-chemical level. Although many attempts to explain consciousness often rely of conjecture or speculation, quantum approaches may indeed lead the field along these lines. Of course, this doesn’t mean that some such theory isn’t correct. One exciting aspect of this approach is the resulting interdisciplinary interest it has generated among physicists and other scientists in the problem of consciousness.

5. Consciousness and Science: Key Issues

Over the past two decades there has been an explosion of interdisciplinary work in the science of consciousness. Some of the credit must go to the ground breaking 1986 book by Patricia Churchland entitled Neurophilosophy. In this section, three of the most important such areas are addressed.

a. The Unity of Consciousness/The Binding Problem

Conscious experience seems to be “unified” in an important sense; this crucial feature of consciousness played an important role in the philosophy of Kant who argued that unified conscious experience must be the product of the (presupposed) synthesizing work of the mind. Getting clear about exactly what is meant by the “unity of consciousness” and explaining how the brain achieves such unity has become a central topic in the study of consciousness. There are many different senses of “unity” (see Tye 2003; Bayne and Chalmers 2003, Dainton 2000, 2008, Bayne 2010), but perhaps most common is the notion that, from the first-person point of view, we experience the world in an integrated way and as a single phenomenal field of experience. (For an important anthology on the subject, see Cleeremans 2003.) However, when one looks at how the brain processes information, one only sees discrete regions of the cortex processing separate aspects of perceptual objects. Even different aspects of the same object, such as its color and shape, are processed in different parts of the brain. Given that there is no “Cartesian theater” in the brain where all this information comes together, the problem arises as to just how the resulting conscious experience is unified. What mechanisms allow us to experience the world in such a unified way? What happens when this unity breaks down, as in various pathological cases? The “problem of integrating the information processed by different regions of the brain is known as the binding problem” (Cleeremans 2003: 1). Thus, the so-called “binding problem” is inextricably linked to explaining the unity of consciousness. As was seen earlier with neural theories (section 4a) and as will be seen below on the neural correlates of consciousness (5b), some attempts to solve the binding problem have to do with trying to isolate the precise brain mechanisms responsible for consciousness. For example, Crick and Koch’s (1990) idea that synchronous neural firings are (at least) necessary for consciousness can also be viewed as an attempt to explain how disparate neural networks bind together separate pieces of information to produce unified subjective conscious experience. Perhaps the binding problem and the hard problem of consciousness (section 3b.i) are very closely connected. If the binding problem can be solved, then we arguably have identified the elusive neural correlate of consciousness and have, therefore, perhaps even solved the hard problem. In addition, perhaps the explanatory gap between third-person scientific knowledge and first-person unified conscious experience can also be bridged. Thus, this exciting area of inquiry is central to some of the deepest questions in the philosophical and scientific exploration of consciousness.

b. The Neural Correlates of Consciousness (NCCs)

As was seen earlier in discussing neural theories of consciousness (section 4a), the search for the so-called “neural correlates of consciousness” (NCCs) is a major preoccupation of philosophers and scientists alike (Metzinger 2000). Narrowing down the precise brain property responsible for consciousness is a different and far more difficult enterprise than merely holding a generic belief in some form of materialism. One leading candidate is offered by Francis Crick and Christof Koch 1990 (see also Crick 1994, Koch 2004). The basic idea is that mental states become conscious when large numbers of neurons all fire in synchrony with one another (oscillations within the 35-75 hertz range or 35-75 cycles per second). Currently, one method used is simply to study some aspect of neural functioning with sophisticated detecting equipments (such as MRIs and PET scans) and then correlate it with first-person reports of conscious experience. Another method is to study the difference in brain activity between those under anesthesia and those not under any such influence. A detailed survey would be impossible to give here, but a number of other candidates for the NCC have emerged over the past two decades, including reentrant cortical feedback loops in the neural circuitry throughout the brain (Edelman 1989, Edelman and Tononi 2000), NMDA-mediated transient neural assemblies (Flohr 1995), and emotive somatosensory haemostatic processes in the frontal lobe (Damasio 1999). To elaborate briefly on Flohr’s theory, the idea is that anesthetics destroy conscious mental activity because they interfere with the functioning of NMDA synapses between neurons, which are those that are dependent on N-methyl-D-aspartate receptors. These and other NCCs are explored at length in Metzinger (2000). Ongoing scientific investigation is significant and an important aspect of current scientific research in the field.

One problem with some of the above candidates is determining exactly how they are related to consciousness. For example, although a case can be made that some of them are necessary for conscious mentality, it is unclear that they are sufficient. That is, some of the above seem to occur unconsciously as well. And pinning down a narrow enough necessary condition is not as easy as it might seem. Another general worry is with the very use of the term “correlate.” As any philosopher, scientist, and even undergraduate student should know, saying that “A is correlated with B” is rather weak (though it is an important first step), especially if one wishes to establish the stronger identity claim between consciousness and neural activity. Even if such a correlation can be established, we cannot automatically conclude that there is an identity relation. Perhaps A causes B or B causes A, and that’s why we find the correlation. Even most dualists can accept such interpretations. Maybe there is some other neural process C which causes both A and B. “Correlation” is not even the same as “cause,” let alone enough to establish “identity.” Finally, some NCCs are not even necessarily put forth as candidates for all conscious states, but rather for certain specific kinds of consciousness (e.g., visual).

c. Philosophical Psychopathology

Philosophers have long been intrigued by disorders of the mind and consciousness. Part of the interest is presumably that if we can understand how consciousness goes wrong, then that can help us to theorize about the normal functioning mind. Going back at least as far as John Locke (1689/1975), there has been some discussion about the philosophical implications of multiple personality disorder (MPD) which is now called “dissociative identity disorder” (DID). Questions abound: Could there be two centers of consciousness in one body? What makes a person the same person over time? What makes a person a person at any given time? These questions are closely linked to the traditional philosophical problem of personal identity, which is also importantly related to some aspects of consciousness research. Much the same can be said for memory disorders, such as various forms of amnesia (see Gennaro 1996a, chapter 9). Does consciousness require some kind of autobiographical memory or psychological continuity? On a related front, there is significant interest in experimental results from patients who have undergone a commisurotomy, which is usually performed to relieve symptoms of severe epilepsy when all else fails. During this procedure, the nerve fibers connecting the two brain hemispheres are cut, resulting in so-called “split-brain” patients (Bayne 2010).

Philosophical interest is so high that there is now a book series called Philosophical Psychopathology published by MIT Press. Another rich source of information comes from the provocative and accessible writings of neurologists on a whole host of psychopathologies, most notably Oliver Sacks (starting with his 1987 book) and, more recently, V. S. Ramachandran (2004; see also Ramachandran and Blakeslee 1998). Another launching point came from the discovery of the phenomenon known as “blindsight” (Weiskrantz 1986), which is very frequently discussed in the philosophical literature regarding its implications for consciousness. Blindsight patients are blind in a well defined part of the visual field (due to cortical damage), but yet, when forced, can guess, with a higher than expected degree of accuracy, the location or orientation of an object in the blind field.

There is also philosophical interest in many other disorders, such as phantom limb pain (where one feels pain in a missing or amputated limb), various agnosias (such as visual agnosia where one is not capable of visually recognizing everyday objects), and anosognosia (which is denial of illness, such as when one claims that a paralyzed limb is still functioning, or when one denies that one is blind). These phenomena raise a number of important philosophical questions and have forced philosophers to rethink some very basic assumptions about the nature of mind and consciousness. Much has also recently been learned about autism and various forms of schizophrenia. A common view is that these disorders involve some kind of deficit in self-consciousness or in one’s ability to use certain self-concepts. (For a nice review article, see Graham 2002.) Synesthesia is also a fascinating abnormal phenomenon, although not really a “pathological” condition as such (Cytowic 2003). Those with synesthesia literally have taste sensations when seeing certain shapes or have color sensations when hearing certain sounds. It is thus an often bizarre mixing of incoming sensory input via different modalities.

One of the exciting results of this relatively new sub-field is the important interdisciplinary interest that it has generated among philosophers, psychologists, and scientists (such as in Graham 2010, Hirstein 2005, and Radden 2004).

6. Animal and Machine Consciousness

Two final areas of interest involve animal and machine consciousness. In the former case it is clear that we have come a long way from the Cartesian view that animals are mere “automata” and that they do not even have conscious experience (perhaps partly because they do not have immortal souls). In addition to the obviously significant behavioral similarities between humans and many animals, much more is known today about other physiological similarities, such as brain and DNA structures. To be sure, there are important differences as well and there are, no doubt, some genuinely difficult “grey areas” where one might have legitimate doubts about some animal or organism consciousness, such as small rodents, some birds and fish, and especially various insects. Nonetheless, it seems fair to say that most philosophers today readily accept the fact that a significant portion of the animal kingdom is capable of having conscious mental states, though there are still notable exceptions to that rule (Carruthers 2000, 2005). Of course, this is not to say that various animals can have all of the same kinds of sophisticated conscious states enjoyed by human beings, such as reflecting on philosophical and mathematical problems, enjoying artworks, thinking about the vast universe or the distant past, and so on. However, it still seems reasonable to believe that animals can have at least some conscious states from rudimentary pains to various perceptual states and perhaps even to some level of self-consciousness. A number of key areas are under continuing investigation. For example, to what extent can animals recognize themselves, such as in a mirror, in order to demonstrate some level of self-awareness? To what extent can animals deceive or empathize with other animals, either of which would indicate awareness of the minds of others? These and other important questions are at the center of much current theorizing about animal cognition. (See Keenan et. al. 2003 and Beckoff et. al. 2002.) In some ways, the problem of knowing about animal minds is an interesting sub-area of the traditional epistemological “problem of other minds”: How do we even know that other humans have conscious minds? What justifies such a belief?

The possibility of machine (or robot) consciousness has intrigued philosophers and non-philosophers alike for decades. Could a machine really think or be conscious? Could a robot really subjectively experience the smelling of a rose or the feeling of pain? One important early launching point was a well-known paper by the mathematician Alan Turing (1950) which proposed what has come to be known as the “Turing test” for machine intelligence and thought (and perhaps consciousness as well). The basic idea is that if a machine could fool an interrogator (who could not see the machine) into thinking that it was human, then we should say it thinks or, at least, has intelligence. However, Turing was probably overly optimistic about whether anything even today can pass the Turing Test, as most programs are specialized and have very narrow uses. One cannot ask the machine about virtually anything, as Turing had envisioned. Moreover, even if a machine or robot could pass the Turing Test, many remain very skeptical as to whether or not this demonstrates genuine machine thinking, let alone consciousness. For one thing, many philosophers would not take such purely behavioral (e.g., linguistic) evidence to support the conclusion that machines are capable of having phenomenal first person experiences. Merely using words like “red” doesn’t ensure that there is the corresponding sensation of red or real grasp of the meaning of “red.” Turing himself considered numerous objections and offered his own replies, many of which are still debated today.

Another much discussed argument is John Searle’s (1980) famous Chinese Room Argument, which has spawned an enormous amount of literature since its original publication (see also Searle 1984; Preston and Bishop 2002). Searle is concerned to reject what he calls “strong AI” which is the view that suitably programmed computers literally have a mind, that is, they really understand language and actually have other mental capacities similar to humans. This is contrasted with “weak AI” which is the view that computers are merely useful tools for studying the mind. The gist of Searle’s argument is that he imagines himself running a program for using Chinese and then shows that he does not understand Chinese; therefore, strong AI is false; that is, running the program does not result in any real understanding (or thought or consciousness, by implication). Searle supports his argument against strong AI by utilizing a thought experiment whereby he is in a room and follows English instructions for manipulating Chinese symbols in order to produce appropriate answers to questions in Chinese. Searle argues that, despite the appearance of understanding Chinese (say, from outside the room), he does not understand Chinese at all. He does not thereby know Chinese, but is merely manipulating symbols on the basis of syntax alone. Since this is what computers do, no computer, merely by following a program, genuinely understands anything. Searle replies to numerous possible criticisms in his original paper (which also comes with extensive peer commentary), but suffice it to say that not everyone is satisfied with his responses. For example, it might be argued that the entire room or “system” understands Chinese if we are forced to use Searle’s analogy and thought experiment. Each part of the room doesn’t understand Chinese (including Searle himself) but the entire system does, which includes the instructions and so on. Searle’s larger argument, however, is that one cannot get semantics (meaning) from syntax (formal symbol manipulation).

Despite heavy criticism of the argument, two central issues are raised by Searle which continue to be of deep interest. First, how and when does one distinguish mere “simulation” of some mental activity from genuine “duplication”? Searle’s view is that computers are, at best, merely simulating understanding and thought, not really duplicating it. Much like we might say that a computerized hurricane simulation does not duplicate a real hurricane, Searle insists the same goes for any alleged computer “mental” activity. We do after all distinguish between real diamonds or leather and mere simulations which are just not the real thing. Second, and perhaps even more important, when considering just why computers really can’t think or be conscious, Searle interestingly reverts back to a biologically based argument. In essence, he says that computers or robots are just not made of the right stuff with the right kind of “causal powers” to produce genuine thought or consciousness. After all, even a materialist does not have to allow that any kind of physical stuff can produce consciousness any more than any type of physical substance can, say, conduct electricity. Of course, this raises a whole host of other questions which go to the heart of the metaphysics of consciousness. To what extent must an organism or system be physiologically like us in order to be conscious? Why is having a certain biological or chemical make up necessary for consciousness? Why exactly couldn’t an appropriately built robot be capable of having conscious mental states? How could we even know either way? However one answers these questions, it seems that building a truly conscious Commander Data is, at best, still just science fiction.

In any case, the growing areas of cognitive science and artificial intelligence are major fields within philosophy of mind and can importantly bear on philosophical questions of consciousness. Much of current research focuses on how to program a computer to model the workings of the human brain, such as with so-called “neural (or connectionist) networks.”

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Author Information

Rocco J. Gennaro
University of Southern Indiana
U. S. A.

John Stuart Mill: Ethics

The ethical theory of John Stuart Mill (1806-1873) is most extensively articulated in his classical text Utilitarianism (1861). Its goal is to justify the utilitarian principle as the foundation of morals. This principle says actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote overall human happiness. So, Mill focuses on consequences of actions and not on rights nor ethical sentiments.

This article primarily examines the central ideas of his text Utilitarianism, but the article's last two sections are devoted to Mill's views on the freedom of the will and the justification of punishment, which are found in System of Logic (1843) and Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy (1865), respectively.

Educated by his father James Mill who was a close friend to Jeremy Bentham, John Stuart Mill came in contact with utilitarian thought at a very early stage of his life. In his Autobiography he claims to have introduced the word “utilitarian” into the English language when he was sixteen. Mill remained a utilitarian throughout his life. Beginning in the 1830s he became increasingly critical of what he calls Bentham’s “theory of human nature”. The two articles “Remarks on Bentham’s Philosophy” (1833) and “Bentham” (1838) are his first important contributions to the development of utilitarian thought. Mill rejects Bentham’s view that humans are unrelentingly driven by narrow self-interest. He believed that a “desire of perfection” and sympathy for fellow human beings belong to human nature. One of the central tenets of Mill’s political outlook is that, not only the rules of society, but also people themselves are capable of improvement.


Table of Contents

  1. Introductory Remarks
  2. Mill’s Theory of Value and the Principle of Utility
  3. Morality as a System of Social Rules
  4. The Role of Moral Rules (Secondary Principles)
  5. Rule or Act Utilitarianism?
  6. Applying the Standard of Morality
  7. The Meaning of the First Formula
  8. Right in Proportion and Tendencies
  9. Utility and Justice
  10. The Proof of Utilitarianism
  11. Evaluating Consequences
  12. Freedom of Will
  13. Responsibility and Punishment
  14. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introductory Remarks

Mill tells us in his Autobiography that the “little work with the name” Utilitarianism arose from unpublished material, the greater part of which he completed in the final years of his marriage to Harriet Taylor, that is, before 1858. For its publication he brought old manuscripts into form and added some new material.

The work first appeared in 1861 as a series of three articles for Fraser’s Magazine, a journal that, though directed at an educated audience, was by no means a philosophical organ. Mill planned from the beginning a separate book publication, which came to light in 1863. Even if the circumstances of the genesis of this work gesture to an occasional piece with a popular goal, on closer examination Utilitarianism turns out to be a carefully conceived work,  rich in thought. One must not forget that since his first reading of Bentham in the winter of 1821-22, the time to which Mill dates his conversion to utilitarianism, forty years had passed. Taken this way, Utilitarianism was anything but a philosophical accessory, and instead the programmatic text of a thinker who for decades had understood himself as a utilitarian and who was profoundly familiar with popular objections to the principle of utility in moral theory. Almost ten years earlier (1852) Mill had defended utilitarianism against the intuitionistic philosopher William Whewell (Whewell on Moral Philosophy).

The priority of the text was to popularize the fundamental thoughts of utilitarianism within influential circles. This goal explains the composition of the work. After some general introductory comments, the text defends utilitarianism from common criticisms ("What Utilitarianism Is"). After this Mill turns to the question concerning moral motivation ("Of the Ultimate Sanction of the Principle of Utility").This is followed by the notorious proof of the principle of utility (“Of What Sort of Proof the Principle of Utility is Susceptible”) and the long concluding chapter on the relation of utility and justice (“On the Connection Between Justice and Utility”). The last chapter is often neglected – and wrongly so, for it contains a central statement of Mill’s understanding of morals; it creates the foundation for the philosopher’s theory of moral rights that plays a preeminent role in the context of his political thought.

According to his early essay “Bentham” (1838), all reasonable moral theories assume that “the morality of actions depends on the consequences which they tend to produce” (CW 10, 111); thus, the difference between moral theories lie on an axiological plane. His own theory of morality, writes Mill in Utilitarianism, is grounded in a particular “theory of life…–namely, that pleasure, and freedom from pain, are the only things desirable as ends.” (CW 10, 210) Such a theory of life is commonly called hedonistic, and it seems appropriate to say that Mill conceives his own position as hedonistic, even if he does never use the word “hedonism” or its cognates. What makes utilitarianism peculiar, according to Mill, is its hedonistic theory of the good (CW 10, 111). Utilitarians are, by definition, hedonists. For this reason, Mill sees no need to differentiate between the utilitarian and the hedonistic aspect of his moral theory.

Modern readers are often confused by the way in which Mill uses the term ‘utilitarianism’. Today we routinely differentiate between hedonism as a theory of the good and utilitarianism as a consequentialist theory of the right. Mill, however, considered both doctrines to be so closely intertwined that he used the term ‘utilitarianism’ to signify both theories. On the one hand, he says that the “utilitarian doctrine is, that happiness is desirable, and the only thing desirable, as an end.” (CW 10, 234) On the other hand, he defines utilitarianism as a moral theory according to which “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness…” (CW 10, 210).

Utilitarians are, for him, consequentialists who believe that pleasure is the only intrinsic value.

Mill counts as one of the great classics of utilitarian thought; but this moral theory deviates from what many contemporary philosophers consider core features of utilitarianism. This explains why the question whether Mill is a utilitarian is more serious than it may appear on first inspection (see Coope 1998). One may respond that this problem results from an anachronistic understanding of utilitarianism, and that it disappears if one abstains from imputing modern philosophical concepts on a philosopher of the nineteenth century. However, this response would oversimplify matters. For it is not clear whether Mill’s value theory was indeed hedonistic (see Brink 1992). As mentioned before, Mill maintains that hedonism is the differentia specifica of utilitarianism; if he were not a hedonist, he would be no utilitarian by his own definition. In view of the fact that Mill’s value theory constitutes the center of his ethics (Donner 1991, 2009), the problem of determining its precise nature and adequate naming has attracted considerable attention over the last 150 years.

2. Mill’s Theory of Value and the Principle of Utility

Mill defines "utilitarianism" as the creed that considers a particular “theory of life” as the “foundation of morals” (CW 10, 210). His view of theory of life was monistic: There is one thing, and one thing only, that is intrinsically desirable, namely pleasure. In contrast to a form of hedonism that conceives pleasure as a homogeneous matter, Mill was convinced that some types of pleasure are more valuable than others in virtue of their inherent qualities. For this reason, his position is often called “qualitative hedonism”. Many philosophers hold that qualitative hedonism is no consistent position. Hedonism asserts that pleasure is the only intrinsic value. Under this assumption, the critics argue, there can be no evaluative basis for the distinction between higher and lower pleasures. Probably the first ones to raise this common objection were the British idealists F. H. Bradley (1876/1988) and T. H. Green (1883/2003).

Which inherent qualities make one kind of pleasure better than another, according to Mill? He declares that the more valuable pleasures are those which employ “higher faculties” (CW 10, 211). The list of such better enjoyments includes “the pleasures of intellect, of the feelings and imagination, and of the moral sentiments” (CW 10, 211). These enjoyments make use of highly developed capacities, like judgment and empathy. In one of his most famous sentences, Mill affirms that it “is better to be a human being dissatisfied than a pig satisfied; better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied” (CW 10, 212). This seems to be a surprising thing to say for a hedonist. However, Mill thought that we have a solid empirical basis for this view. According to him, the best obtainable evidence for value claims consists in what all or almost all people judge as valuable across a vast variety of cases and cultures. He makes the empirical assertion that all or almost all people prefer a “manner of existence” (CW 10, 211) that employs higher faculties to a manner of existence which does not. The fact that “all or almost all” who are acquainted with pleasures that employ higher faculties agree that they are preferable to the lower ones, is empirical evidence for the claim that they are indeed of higher value. Accordingly, the best human life (“manner of existence”) is one in which the higher faculties play an adequate part. This partly explains why he put such great emphasis on education.

3. Morality as a System of Social Rules

The fifth and final chapter of Utilitarianism is of unusual importance for Mill’s theory of moral obligation. Until the 1970s, the significance of the chapter had been largely overlooked. It then became one of the bridgeheads of a revisionist interpretation of Mill, which is associated with the work of David Lyons, John Skorupski and others.

Mill worked very hard to hammer the fifth chapter into shape and his success has great meaning for him. Towards the end of the book he maintains the “considerations which have now been adduced resolve, I conceive, the only real difficulty in the utilitarian theory of morals.” (CW 10, 259)

At the beginning of Utilitarianism, Mill postulates that moral judgments presume rules (CW 10, 206). In contrast to Kant who grounds his ethical theory on self-imposed rules, so-called maxims, Mill thinks that morality builds on social rules. But what makes social rules moral rules? Mill’s answer is based on a thesis about how competent speakers use the phrase “morally right” or “morally wrong”. He maintains that we name a type of action morally wrong if we think that it should be sanctioned either through formal punishment, public disapproval (external sanctions) or through a bad conscience (internal sanctions). This is the critical difference between “morality and simple expediency” (CW 10, 246). Wrong or inexpedient actions are those that we cannot recommend to a person, like harming oneself. But in contrast to immoral actions, inexpedient actions are not worthy of being sanctioned.

Mill differentiates various spheres of action. In his System of Logic he names morality, prudence and aesthetics as the three departments of the “Art of Life” (CW 8, 949). The principle of utility governs not only morality, but also prudence and taste (CW 8, 951). It is not a moral principle but a meta-principle of practical reason (Skorupski 1989, 310-313).

There is a field of action in which moral rules obtain, and a “person may rightfully be compelled to fulfill” them (CW 10, 246). But there are also fields of action, in which sanctions for wrong behavior would be inappropriate. One of them is the sphere of self-regarding acts with which Mill deals in On Liberty. In this private sphere we can act at our convenience and indulge in inexpedient and utterly useless behavior as long as we do not harm others.

It is fundamental to keep in mind that Mill looks into morality as a social practice and not as autonomous self-determination by reason, like Kant. For Kantians, moral deliberation determines those actions which we have the most reason to perform. Mill disagrees; for him, it makes sense to say that “A is the right thing to do for Jeremy, but Jeremy is not morally obliged to do A.”For instance, even if Jeremy is capable of writing a brilliant book that would improve the life of millions (and deteriorate none), he is not morally obliged to do so. According to Mill, our moral obligations result from the justified part of the moral code of our society; and the task of moral philosophy consists in bringing the moral code of a society in better accordance with the principle of utility.

4. The Role of Moral Rules (Secondary Principles)

In Utilitarianism, Mill designs the following model of moral deliberation. In the first step the actor should examine which of the rules (secondary principles) in the moral code of his or her society are pertinent in the given situation. If in a given situation moral rules (secondary principles) conflict, then (and only then) can the second step invoke the formula of utility (CW 10, 226) as a first principle. Pointedly one could say: the principle of utility is for Mill not a component of morality, but instead its basis. It serves the validation of rightness for our moral system and allows – as a meta-rule – the decision of conflicting norms. In the introductory chapter of Utilitarianism, Mill maintains that it would be “easy to show that whatever steadiness or consistency these moral beliefs have attained, has been mainly due to the tacit influence of a standard not recognized” (CW 10, 207), namely the principle of utility. The tacit influence of the principle of utility made sure that a considerable part of the moral code of our society is justified (promotes general well-being). But other parts are clearly unjustified. One case that worried Mill deeply was the role of women in Victorian Britain. In “The Subjection of Women” (1869) he criticizesthe “legal subordination of one sex to the other” (CW 21, 261) as incompatible with “all the principles involved in modern society” (CW 21, 280).

Moral rules are also critical for Mill because he takes human action in essence as to be guided by dispositions. A virtuous person has the disposition to follow moral rules. In his early essay “Remarks on Bentham’s Philosophy” (1833) he asserts that a “man is not really virtuous” (CW 10, 12), unless the mere thought of committing certain acts is so painful that he does not even consider the possibility that they may have good consequences. He repeats this point in his System of Logic (1843)and Utilitarianism:

[T]he mind is not in a right state, not in a state conformable to Utility, not in the state most conducive to the general happiness, unless it does love virtue in this manner - as a thing desirable in itself, even although, in the individual instance, it should not produce those other desirable consequences which it tends to produce, and on account of which it is held to be virtue. (CW 10, 235 and 8, 952).

It is one thing to say that it could have optimal consequences (and thus be objectively better) to break a moral rule in a concrete singular case. Another is the question as to whether it would facilitate happiness to educate humans such that they would have the disposition to maximize situational utility. Mill answers the latter in the negative. Again, the upshot is that education matters. Humans are guided by acquired dispositions. This makes moral degeneration, but also moral progress possible.

5. Rule or Act Utilitarianism?

There is considerable disagreement as to whether Mill should be read as a rule utilitarian or an (indirect) act utilitarian. Many philosophers look upon rule utilitarianism as an untenable position and favor an act utilitarian reading of Mill (Crisp 1997). Under the pressure of many contradicting passages, however, a straightforward act utilitarian interpretation is difficult to sustain. Recent studies emphasize Mill’s rule utilitarian leanings (Miller 2010, 2011) or find elements of both theories in Mill (West 2004).

In Utilitarianism he seems to give two different formulations of the utilitarian standard. The first points in an act utilitarian, the second in a rule utilitarian direction. Since act and rule utilitarianism are incompatible claims about what makes actions morally right, the formulations open up the fundamental question concerning what style of utilitarianism Mill wants to advocate and whether his moral theory forms a consistent whole. It is important to note that the distinction between rule and act utilitarianism had not yet been introduced in Mill’s days. Thus Mill is not to blame for failing to make explicit which of the two approaches he advocates.

In the first and more famous formulation of the utilitarian standard (First Formula) Mill states:

The creed which accepts as the foundation of morals, Utility, or the Greatest Happiness Principle, holds that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness. By happiness is intended pleasure, and the absence of pain; by unhappiness, pain, and the privation of pleasure. To give a clear view of the moral standard set up by the theory, much more requires to be said (…). But these supplementary explanations do not affect the theory of life on which this theory of morality is grounded….” (CW, 210, emphasis mine)

Just a few pages later, following his presentation of qualitative hedonism, Mill gives his second formulation (Second Formula):

According to the Greatest Happiness Principle (…) the ultimate end (…) is an existence exempt as far as possible from pain, and as rich as possible in enjoyments, both in point of quantity and quality; (…). This, being, according to the utilitarian opinion, the end of human action, is necessarily also the standard of morality; which may accordingly be defined, the rules and precepts for human conduct, by the observance of which an existence such as has been described might be, to the greatest extent possible, secured to all mankind; and not to them only, but, so far as the nature of things admits, to the whole sentient creation. (CW, 214, emphasis mine)

The Second Formula relates the principle of utility to rules and precepts and not to actions. It seems to say that an act is correct when it corresponds to rules whose preservation increases the mass of happiness in the world. And this appears to be a rule-utilitarian conception.

In the light of these passages, it is not surprising that the question whether Mill is an act- or a rule-utilitarian has been intensely debated. In order to understand his position it is important to differentiate between two ways of defining act and rule utilitarianism. (i) One can conceive of them as competing theories about objective rightness. An action is objectively right if it is the thing which the agent has most reason to do. Act utilitarianism would say that an action is objectively right, if it actually promotes happiness. For rule utilitarianism, in contrast, an action would be objectively right, if it actually corresponds to rules that promote happiness.

(ii) One can also conceive of act- and rule utilitarianism as theories about moral obligation. Act utilitarianism requires us to aim for the maximization of happiness; rule utilitarianism, in contrast, requires us to observe rules that facilitate happiness. Understood as a theory about moral obligation, act utilitarianism postulates: Act in a way that promotes happiness the most. Rule utilitarianism claims, on the other hand: Follow a rule whose general observance promotes happiness the most.

Mill is in regard to (i) an act utilitarian and in regard to (ii) a rule utilitarian. This way the seeming contradiction between the First and the Second Formula can be resolved. The First Formula states what is right and what an agent has most reason to do. It points to the “foundation of morals”. In contrast, the Second Formula tells us what our moral obligations are. We are morally obliged to follow those social rules and precepts the observance of which promotes happiness in the greatest extent possible.

6. Applying the Standard of Morality

In “Whewell on Moral Philosophy” (1852), Mill rejects an objection raised by one of his most competent philosophical adversaries. Whewell claimed that utilitarianism permits murder and other crimes in particular circumstances and is therefore incompatible with our considered moral judgments. Mill’s discussion of Whewell’s criticism is exceedingly helpful in clarifying his ethical approach:

Take, for example, the case of murder. There are many persons to kill whom would be to remove men who are a cause of no good to any human being, of cruel physical and moral suffering to several, and whose whole influence tends to increase the mass of unhappiness and vice. Were such a man to be assassinated, the balance of traceable consequences would be greatly in favour of the act. (CW 10, 181)

Mill gives no concrete case. Since he wrote – together with his wife Harriet Taylor –a couple of articles on horrible cases of domestic violence in the early 1850s, he might have had the likes of Robert Curtis Bird in mind, a man who tortured his servant Mary Ann Parsons to death [see CW 25 (The Case of Mary Ann Parsons), 1151-1153].Does utilitarianism require us to kill such people who are the “cause of no good to any human being, of cruel physical and moral suffering to several”? Mill answers in the negative. His main point is that nobody’s life would be safe if people were allowed to kill others whom they believe to be a source of unhappiness (CW 10, 182). Thus, a general rule that would allow to “remove men who are a cause of no good” would be worse than a general rule that does not allow such acts. People should follow the rule not to kill other humans because the general observance of this rule tends to promote the happiness of all.

This argument can be interpreted in a rule utilitarian or an indirect act utilitarian fashion. Along indirect act utilitarian lines, one could maintain that we would be cognitively overwhelmed by the task of calculating the consequences of any action. We therefore need rules as touchstones that point us to the path of action which tends to promote the greatest general happiness. Mill compares, in a critical passage, the core principles of our established morality (which he also calls “secondary principles”) with the Nautical Almanack, a companion for navigating a voyage (CW 10, 225). Just as the Nautical Almanackis not first calculated at sea, but instead exists as already calculated, the agent must not in individual cases calculate the expected utility. In his moral deliberation the agent can appeal to secondary principles, such as the prohibition of homicide, as an approximate solution for the estimated problem.

Apparently, the act utilitarian interpretation finds further support in a letter Mill wrote to John Venn in 1872. He states:

I agree with you that the right way of testing actions by their consequences, is to test them by their natural consequences of the particular actions, and not by those which would follow if everyone did the same. But, for the most part, considerations of what would happen if everyone did the same, is the only means we have of discovering the tendency of the act in the particular case. (CW 17, 1881)

Mill argues that in many cases we can assess the actual, expected consequences of an action, only if we hypothetically consider that all would act in the same manner. This means we recognize that the consequences of this particular action would be damaging if everyone acted that way. A similar consideration is found in the Whewell essay. Here Mill argues: If a hundred breaches of rule (homicides, in this case) led to a particular harm (murderous chaos), then a single breach of rule is responsible for a hundredth of the harm. This hundredth of harm offsets the expected utility of this particular breach of rule (CW 10, 182). Mill believes that the breach of the rule is wrong because it is actually harmful. The argument is questionable because Mill overturns the presumption he introduces: that the actual consequences of the considered action would be beneficial. If the breach of the rule is actually harmful, then it is to be rejected in every conceivable version of utilitarianism. The result is trivial then and misses the criticism that act utilitarianism has counter-intuitive implications in particular circumstances.

There is one crucial difficulty with the interpretation of Mill as an indirect act utilitarian regarding moral obligation. If the function of rules was in fact only epistemic, as suggested by indirect act utilitarianism, one would expect that the principle of utility – when the epistemic conditions are satisfactory – can be and should be directly applied. But Mill is quite explicit here. The utilitarian principle should only be applied when moral rules conflict:“We must remember that only in these cases of conflict between secondary principles is it requisite that first principles should be appealed to.” (CW 10, 226). From an act utilitarian view regarding moral obligation, this is implausible. Why should one be morally obliged to follow a rule of which one positively knows that its observance in a particular case will not promote general utility?

Coming back to the example, it is important to remember that “the balance of traceable consequences would be greatly in favour of the act [of homicide].” (CW 10, 181) Thus, according to an act utilitarian approach regarding moral obligation it would be morally allowed, if not required, to kill the man.

As mentioned, Mill arrives at a different conclusion. His position can be best understood with recourse to the distinction between the theory of objective rightness and the theory of moral obligation introduced in the last section. Seen from the perspective of an all-knowing and impartial observer, it is – in regard to the given description – objectively right to perpetrate the homicide. However, moral laws, permissions, and prohibitions are not made for omniscient and impartial observers, but instead for cognitively limited and partial beings like humans whose actions are mainly guided by acquired dispositions. Their capacity to recognize what would be objectively right is imperfect; and their ability to motivate themselves to do the right thing is limited. As quoted before in his “Remarks on Bentham’s Philosophy” (1833),he states that some violations of the established moral code are simply unthinkable for the members of society: people recoil “from the very thought of committing” (CW 10, 12) particular acts. Because humans cannot reliably recognize objective rightness and, in critical cases, cannot bring themselves to act objectively right, they are not obliged to maximize happiness. For ought implies can. In regard to the given description, the fact that the assassination of a human would be objectively right does not imply that the assassination of this human would be morally imperative or allowed. In other words: Mill differentiates between the objectively right act and the morally right act. With this he can argue that the assassination would be forbidden (theory of moral obligation). To enact a forbidden action is morally wrong. As noted, Mill’s theory allows for the possibility that an action is objectively right, but morally wrong (prohibited). An action can be wrong (bearing unhappiness), but its enactment would be no less morally right (Lyons 1978/1994, 70).

Thus, Mill’s considered position should be interpreted in the following way: First, the objective rightness of an act depends upon actual consequences; second, in order to know what we are morally obliged to do we have to draw on justified rules of the established moral code.

7. The Meaning of the First Formula

What has been said about Mill’s conception of morality as a system of social rules is relevant for the interpretation of Mill’s First Formula of utilitarianism. The Formula says that actions are right “in proportion as they tend to promote happiness” and wrong “as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness” (CW 10, 210). Roughly said, actions are right insofar as they facilitate happiness, and wrong insofar as they result in suffering. Mill does not write “morally right” or “morally wrong”, but simply “right” and “wrong”. This is important. Mill emphasizes in many places that virtuous actions can exhibit a negative balance of happiness in a singular case. If the word “moral” occurred in the First Formula, then the noted virtuous actions would be, for Mill, morally wrong. But as we have seen, this is not his view. Virtuous actions are morally right, even if they are objectively wrong under particular circumstances.

Accordingly, the First Formula is not to be interpreted as drafting a moral duty. It is a general statement about what makes actions right (reasonable, expedient) or wrong. The First Formula gives a general characterization of practical reason. It says that the promotion of happiness makes an action objectively right (but not necessarily morally right); or, as Mill says in his System of Logic, “the promotion of happiness is the ultimate principle of Teleology” (CW 8, 951) An action is objectively right if it maximizes happiness; however, an action is morally right if it is in accordance with social rules which are protected by internal and external sanctions and which tend to promote general utility. Subsets of right ones are morally right actions; subsets of wrong actions are morally wrong.

Mill’s differentiation between a moral and a non-moral sphere of action is not far from our everyday understanding. We generally believe that not all actions must be judged in regard to a moral point of view. This does not exclude us from valuing actions, which are not in the moral realm, in regard to prudence. Less evident is how one should take Mill’s claim that the promotion of happiness can be understood as a general principle of rightness even with respect to artistic production. Many artists would presumably not be comfortable with the thesis that good art arises from the goal of facilitating the happiness of humankind. This however is not what Mill means. Apart from cases of conflict between secondary principles, the First Formula does not guide action. Just as Mill speaks in a moral context about how noble characters will not strive to maximize general happiness (CW 8, 952), he could argue in an aesthetic context that artists should work from a purely aesthetic point of view. The rules of artistic judgments, nonetheless, are justified through their contribution to the flourishing of human life.

To summarize the essential points: Mill can be characterized as an act utilitarian in regard to the theory of objective rightness, but as a rule utilitarian in regard to the theory of moral obligation. He defines morality as a system of rules that is protected by sanctions. The principle of utility is not a part of this system, but its fundamental justification (the “foundation of morality” (CW 10, 205)).

8. Right in Proportion and Tendencies

(i) For contemporary readers it is striking that Mill’s First Formula does not explicitly relate to maximization. Mill does not write, as one might expect, that only the action which leads to the best consequences is right. In other places in the text we hear of the “promotion” or “multiplication” of happiness, and not of the “maximization”. Alone does the “Greatest Happiness Principle” explicitly refer to maximization. The actual formula, in contrast, has to do with gradual differences (right in proportion). Actions which add to the sum of happiness in the world but fail to maximize happiness thus can be right, even if to a lesser degree.

This is confusing insofar as it would be unreasonable to prefer that which is worse to that which is better. For every good there is a better that one should reasonably choose until one succeeds to the best. If the First Formula expresses the ideal of practical reason, then one should expect that it requires maximization. Maybe Mill’s point is that the search for a global best option would exceed the cognitive capabilities of humans. He probably does not want to suggest that an agent should not choose the best local option. But the local best option must not represent the objective (global) best. This may be the reason why Mill does not refer to maximization in the formula of utility.

(ii) A further complication arises with the word “tend”. According to the formula of utility, actions are more or less correct insofar as they facilitate happiness (CW 10, 210). It is doubtlessly not the same to say that an action is right if it actually facilitates happiness, or to say that it is right if it tends to facilitate happiness. The model seems to be roughly this: At the neutral point of the preference scale, actions have the tendency – in regard to the status quo – to neither increase nor decrease the mass of utility in the world. All actions that tend to facilitate happiness are right, all actions that tend to be harmful are wrong, but all are not in the same measure. An action has a high positive value on the scale of preference, if its tendency to facilitate happiness is high. An action has highly negative value on the preference scale, if its tendency to evoke unhappiness is high. But what does the concept “tendency” mean precisely?

In everyday language, we often use the word “tend” in the sense of “will probably lead to”. That an action tends to produce a particular consequence means that this consequence has a high probability. Mill could have wanted to say that an action is right in proportion to the probability with which it promotes happiness. This makes sense when we compare options that produce the same amount of happiness. But what about cases in which two actions produce different amounts of pleasure? One plausible answer is that both dimensions must be regarded: the amount of happiness and the probability of its occurrence. Action A is better than action B, if the expected happinessfor Ais greater than the expected happiness for B. If one reads Mill this way, then “in proportion” relates to “promote” and to “tend”. The best action is one that maximizes the amount of expected happiness.

9. Utility and Justice

In the final chapter of Utilitarianism, Mill turns to the sentiment of justice. Actions that are perceived as unjust provoke outrage. The spontaneity of this feeling and its intensity makes it impossible for it to be ignored by the theory of morals. Mill considers two possible interpretations of the source of the sentiment of justice: first of all, that we are equipped with a sense of justice which is an independent source of moral judgment; second, that there is a general and independent principle of justice. Both interpretations are irreconcilable with Mill’s position, and thus it is no wonder that he takes this issue to be of exceptional importance. He names the integration of justice the only real difficulty for utilitarian theory (CW 10, 259).

Mill splits this problem of integration into three tasks: The first consists in explaining the intensity and spontaneity of the sentiment of justice. The second task is to make plausible that the various types of judgments about justice can be traced back to a systematic core; and the third task consists in showing that the principle of utility constructs this core.

In a nutshell, Mill explains the sentiment of justice as the sublimation of the impulse to take revenge for perceived mortifications of all kinds. Mill sees vengeance as “an animal desire” (CW 10, 250) that operates in the service of self-preservation. If it is known that one will not accept interventions in spheres of influence and interest, the probability of such interventions dwindles. The preparedness to take revenge tends to deter aggression in the first place. Thus, a reputation for vindictiveness – at first glance an irrational trait – arguably has survival value. This helps to explain why the sentiment is so widespread and vehement.

Our sentiment of justice, for Mill, is based on a refinement and sublimation of this animal desire. Humans are capable of empathizing such that the pleasure of others can instill one’s own pleasure, and the mere sight of suffering can cause own suffering. The hurting of another person or even an animal may therefore produce a very similar affect as the hurting of one’s own person. Mill considers the extension of the animal impulse of vengeance on those with whom we have sympathy as “natural” (CW 10, 248), because the social feelings are for him natural. This natural extension of the impulse of revenge with the help of the social feelings represents a step in the direction of cultivating and refining human motivation. People begin to feel outrage when the interests of the members of their tribe are being violated or when shared social rules are being disregarded.

Gradually, sympathy becomes more inclusive. Humans discover that co-operation with people outside the tribe is advantageous. The “human capacity of enlarged sympathy” follows suit (CW 10, 248).

As soon as humans begin to think about which parts of the moral code of a society are justified and which parts are not, they inevitably begin to consider consequences. This often occurs in non-systematic, prejudiced or distorted ways. Across historical periods of times, the correct ideas of intrinsic good and moral rightness will gradually gain more influence. Judgments about justice approximate progressively the requirements of utilitarianism: The rules upon which the judgments about justice rest will be assessed in light of their tendency to promote happiness. To summarize: Our sentiment of justice receives its intensity from the “animal desire to repel or retaliate a hurt or damage to oneself”, and its morality from the “human capacity of enlarged sympathy” and intelligent self-interest (CW 10, 250).

According to Mill, when we see a social practice or a type of action as unjust, we see that the moral rights of persons were harmed. The thought of moral rights is the systematic core of our judgments of justice. Rights breed perfect obligations, says Mill. Moral rights are concerned with the basic conditions of a good life. They protect an “extraordinarily important and impressive kind of utility.” (CW 10, 250-251). Mill subsumes this important and impressive kind of utility under the term security, “the most vital of all interests” (CW 10, 251). It comprises such things as protection from aggression or starvation, the possibility to shape one’s own life unmolested by others and enforcement of contracts. Thus, the requirements of justice “stand higher in the scale of social utility” (CW 259).To have a moral right means to have something that society is morally required to guard either through the compulsion of law, education or the pressure of public opinion (CW 10, 250). Because everyone has an interest in the security of these conditions, it is desirable that the members of society reciprocally guarantee each other “to join in making safe for us the very groundwork of our existence” (CW 10, 251).Insofar as moral rights secure the basis of our existence, they serve our natural interest in self-preservation – this is the reason why their harm calls forth such intense emotional reactions. The interplay of social feelings and moral education explains, in turn, why we are not only upset by injustices when we personally suffer, but also when the elemental rights of others are harmed. This motivates us to sanction the suffering of others as unjust. Moral rights thus form the “most sacred and binding part of all morality” (CW 10, 255). But they do not exhaust the moral realm. There are imperfect obligations which have no correlative right (CW 10, 247).

The thesis that moral rights form the systematic core of our judgments of justice is by no means unique to utilitarianism. Many people take it to be evident that individuals have absolute, inalienable rights; but they doubt that these rights can be grounded in the principle of utility. Intuitionists may claim that we recognize moral rights spontaneously, that we have intuitive knowledge of them. In order to reject such a view, Mill points out that our judgments of justice do not form a systematic order. If we had a sense of justice that would allow us to recognize what is just, similar to how touch reveals forms or sight reveals color, then we would expect that our corresponding judgments would exhibit a high degree of reliability, definitude and unanimity. But experience teaches us that our judgments regarding just punishments, just tax laws or just remuneration for waged labor are anything but unanimous. The intuitionists must therefore mobilize a first principle that is independent of experience and that secures the unity and consistency of our theory of justice. So far they have not succeeded. Mill sees no suggestion that is plausible or which has been met with general acceptance.

10. The Proof of Utilitarianism

What Mill names the “proof” of utilitarianism belongs presumably to the most frequently attacked text passages in the history of philosophy. Geoffrey Sayre-McCord once remarked that Mill seems to answer by example the question of how many serious mistakes a brilliant philosopher can make within a brief paragraph (Sayre-McCord 2001, 330). Meanwhile the secondary literature has made it clear that Mill’s proof contains no logical fallacies and is less foolish than often portrayed.

It is found in the fourth part, “Of What Sort of Proof the Principle of Utility is Susceptible”, of Utilitarianism. For the assessment of the proof two introductory comments are helpful. Already at the beginning of Utilitarianism, Mill points out that “questions of ultimate ends are not amenable to direct proof.” (CW 10, 207). Notwithstanding, it is possible to give reasons for theories about the good, and these considerations are “equivalent to proof” (CW 10, 208). These reasons are empirical and touch upon the careful observation of oneself and others. More cannot be done and should not be expected in a proof re ultimate ends.

A further introductory comment concerns the basis of observation through which Mill seeks to support utilitarianism. In moral philosophy the appeal to intuitions plays a prominent role. They are used to justify moral claims and to check the plausibility of moral theories. The task of thought-experiments in testing ethical theories is analogous to the observation of facts in testing empirical theories. This suggests that intuitions are the right observational basis for the justification of first moral principles. Mill, however, was a fervent critic of intuitionism throughout his philosophical work. In his Autobiography he calls intuitionism “the great intellectual support of false doctrines and bad institutions.” (CW 1, 232). Mill considered the idea that truths can be known a priori, independently of observation and experience, to be a stronghold of conservatism.

His argument against intuitionistic approaches to moral philosophy has two parts. The first part points out that intuitionists have not been able to bring our intuitive moral judgments into a system. There is neither a complete list of intuitive moral precepts nor a basic principle of morality which would found such a list(CW 10, 206).

The second part of the Millian argument consists in an explanation of this result: What some call moral intuition is actually the result of our education and present social discourse. Society inculcates us with our moral views, and we come to believe strongly in their unquestionable truth. There is no system, no basic principle in the moral views of the Victorian era though. In The Subjection of Women, Mill caustically criticizes the moral intuitions of his contemporaries regarding the role of women. He finds them incompatible with the basic principles of the modern world, such as equality and liberty. Because the first principle of morality is missing, intuitionist ethics is in many regards just a decoration of the moral prejudices with which one is brought up –“(…) not so much a guide as a consecration of men’s actual sentiments” (CW 10, 207).

What we need, Mill contends, is a basis of observation that verifies a first principle, a principle that is capable of bringing our practice of moral judgments into order. This elemental observational basis – and this is the core idea in Mill’s proof – is human aspiration.

His argument for the utilitarian principle – if not a deductive argument, an argument all the same – involves three steps. First, Mill argues that it is reasonable for humans to aspire to one’s own well-being; second, that it is reasonable to support the well-being of all persons (instead of only one’s own); and third, that well-being represents the only ultimate goal and the rightness of our actions is to be measured exclusively in regard to the balance of happiness to which they lead (CW 10, 234).

Let us turn to the first step of the argument. Upon an initial reading it seems in fact to have little success. Mill argues that one’s own well-being is worthy of striving for because each of us strives for his or her own well-being. Here he leans on a questionable analogy: “The only proof capable of being given that an object is visible, is that people actually see it. […] In like manner, I apprehend, the sole evidence it is possible to produce that anything is desirable, is that people do actually desire it.” (CW 10, 234).

Can a more evident logical fallacy be given than the claim that something is worthy of striving for because it is factually sought? But Mill in no way believes that the relation between desirable and desired is a matter of definition. He is not saying that desirable objects are by definition objects which people desire; he writes instead that what people desire is the only evidence for what is desirable. If we want to know what is ultimately desirable for humans, we have to acquire observational knowledge about what humans ultimately strive for.

Mill’s argument is simple: We know by observation that people desire their own happiness. With a conclusion that Mill calls “inductive”, and to which he ascribes a central role in regard to our acquisition of knowledge, we succeed to the general thesis that all humans finally aspire to their happiness. This inductive conclusion serves as evidence for the claim that one’s own happiness is not only desired, but desirable, worthy of aspiration. Mill thus supports the thesis that one’s own happiness is an ultimate good to oneself with the observation that every human ultimately strives for his or her own well-being.

On this basis, Mill concludes in the second step of his proof that the happiness of all is also a good: “…each person’s happiness is a good to that person, and the general happiness, therefore, a good to the aggregate of all persons.” (CW 10, 234).

The “therefore” in the cited sentence above has evoked many a raised eyebrows. Does Mill claim here that each person tries to promote the happiness of all? This seems to be patently wrong. In a famous letter to a Henry Jones, he clarifies that he did not mean that every person, in fact, strives for the general good. “I merely meant in this particular sentence to argue that since A's happiness is a good, B's a good, C's a good, &c., the sum of all these goods must be a good.” (CW 16, 1414, Letter 1257).

Indeed, in the “particular sentence” he just concludes that general happiness is a “good to the aggregate of all persons.” Nonetheless, one may doubt that Mill adequately responds to Jones’ reservations. It is unclear what it means that general happiness is the good of the aggregate of all persons. Neither each person, nor the aggregate of all persons seem to strive for the happiness of all. But Mill’s point in the second step of the argument is arguably a more modest one.

He simply wanted to vindicate the claim that if each person’s happiness is a good to each person, then we are entitled to conclude that general happiness is also a good. As he says in the letter to Jones: “the sum of all these goods must be a good.” Similar to the first step of the argument we have here an epistemic relationship: The fact that each person is striving for his or her own happiness is evidence that happiness as such (regardless to whom) is valuable. If happiness as such is valuable, it is not unreasonable to promote the well-being of all sentient beings. With this, the second step of the argument is complete. The result may seem meager at first. That it is not unreasonable to promote the happiness of all appears to be no particularly controversial claim. On closer inspection, however, Mill’s conclusion is quite interesting since it imposes pressure on self-interest theories of practical rationality. The “notion that self-interest possesses a special, underived rationality (…) seems suddenly to require justification.” (Skorupski 1989, 311).What Mill fails to show is that each person has most reason to promote the general good. One should note, however, that the aim of the proof is not to answer the question why one should be moral. Mill does not want to demonstrate that we have reason to prefer general happiness to personal happiness.

Hedonism states not only that happiness is intrinsically good, but also that it is the only good and thus the only measure for our action. To show this, is the goal of the third step of the proof. Mill’s reflections in this step are based on psychological hedonism and the principle of association. According to Mill, humans cannot desire anything except that which is either aninstrument to or a component of happiness. He concedes that people seem to strive for every possible thing as ultimate ends. Philosophers may pursue knowledge as their ultimate goal; others value virtue, fame or wealth. Corresponding to his basic thesis that “the sole evidence it is possible to produce that anything is desirable, is that people do actually desire it” (CW 10, 234), Mill must consider the possibility that knowledge, fame or wealth have intrinsic value.

He blocks this inference with the thesis that humans do not “naturally and originally” (CW 10, 235) desire other goods than happiness. That knowledge, virtue, wealth or fame is seen as intrinsically valuable is due to the operation of the principle of association. In the course of our socialization, goods, like knowledge, virtue, wealth or fame acquire value by their association with pleasure. A philosopher came to experience knowledge as pleasurable, and this is why he desires it. Humans strive for virtue and other goods only if they are associated with the natural and original tendency to seek pleasure and avoid pain. Virtue, knowledge or wealth can thus become parts of happiness. At this point, Mill declares that the proof is completed.

11. Evaluating Consequences

According to Mill’s Second Formula of the utilitarian standard, a good human life must be rich in enjoyments, in both quantitative and qualitative respects. A manner of existence without access to the higher pleasures is not desirable: “It is better to be a human being dissatisfied than a pig satisfied; better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied.” (CW 10, 212).

The life of Socrates is better because no person who is familiar with higher pleasures will trade the joy of philosophizing against an even infinite amount of lower pleasures, Mill suggests. This does not amount to a modern version of Aristotle’s’ view that only a life completely devoted to theoretical activity is desirable. One must not forget that Mill is a hedonist after all. What kind of life is joyful and therefore good for a particular person depends upon many factors, such as tastes, talents and character. There are a great variety of lifestyles that are equally good. But Mill insists that a human life that is completely deprived of higher pleasures is not as good as it could be. It is not a desirable “mode of existence”, nothing a “competent judge” would choose.

Utilitarianism demands that we establish and observe a system of social, legal and moral rules that enables all mankind to have the best life possible, a life that is “as rich as possible in enjoyments, both in point of quantity and quality” (CW 10, 214). Mill’s statement that every human has an equal claim “to all the means of happiness” (CW 10, 258), belongs in this context. Society must make sure that the social-economic preconditions of a non-impoverished life prevail. In one text passage, Mill even includes the happiness of animals. Animals, too, should have the best possible life, “so far as the nature of things admits” (CW 10, 214).

The Second Formula maintains that a set of social rules A is better than the set B, if in A less humans suffer from an impoverished, unhappy life and more enjoy a fulfilled, rich life than in B.

More difficult is the question how to evaluate scenarios that involve unequal population sizes. With Mill there is no explicit unpacking of this problem; but his advocacy of the regulation of birth gives us at least an indication of the direction in which his considerations would go. Let us consider the following example: Which world would be better: world X in which 1000 humans have a fulfilled life and 100 a bad one, or world Y in which 10000 humans have a fulfilled life and 800 an impoverished one? The answer to this question depends on whether we focus on the minimizing the number of bad lives or on maximizing the number of good lives, and whether we measure this absolutely or relatively to the total population.

(i) One possible answer concerns the minimization of the number of bad lives. This can mean the absolute number of humans with joyless or impoverished lives. If one answers this way, then world X would be better than world Y because in this world the absolute number of humans with bad lives would be less. But it is also possible to think of the Second Formula as a statement about the relative number of humans with bad lives; in this case world Y would be preferable.

(ii) Another possible answer emphasizes the maximization of fulfilled lives. If one follows this interpretation, then world Y is better than world X because in this world absolute and relative measurements suggest that more humans have fulfilled lives.

Under the influence of Malthus, Mill insisted throughout his work that the problem of poverty is to be resolved only through a reduction of the population number – as noted, he encouraged the regulation of birth. This proposal is reconcilable with all three interpretations, but does not bear any relation to the question concerning which of the interpretations he could have preferred. One can speculate how Mill would answer, but there is not clear textual basis.

A further theme that Mill does not address concerns the problem of measurement and the interpersonal comparison of quantities of happiness. From an utilitarian point of view, other things being equal, it makes no moral difference whether A or B experiences an equal quantity of happiness (CW 10, 258). A quantity of happiness for A bears precisely as much value as a quantity of happiness for B. But this answers neither the question of measurement nor the question of the comparison of interpersonal utility. Can quantities of happiness be measured like temperatures? The philosopher and economist Francis Edgeworth spoke in his 1881 Mathematical Psychics of a fictitious instrument of measurement, a hedonimeter, with whose help the quantities of pleasure and pain could be determined with scientific accuracy.

Or do amounts of happiness have to be assessed approximately, such that Harriet Taylor for example can say that she is happier today than she was yesterday. Interpersonal comparisons of utility are confronted with the related question whether and under which conditions one can say that, for instance, Harriet Taylor and John Stuart Mill experience an equal amount of happiness.

Mill gave both themes little attention. But probably he was convinced that precise measurement and comparison of interpersonal utility would not be needed, maybe not even possible. One often does not need a thermometer to discern whether or not an object is warmer than another. Similarly, in many cases we do not need something like a hedonimeter to judge whether the condition of world A is better than that of world B. We need only a reasonable degree of experience and the capacity to empathize. Often, though, we may be unsure what to say. Which of two systems of income tax, for instance, promotes general happiness more? Mill’s position here seems to be that we have to decide questions like these by means of public debate and not by means of a hedonimeter.

Regarding moral rights, “the most sacred and binding part of all morality” (CW 10, 255), all competent judges seem to agree that they promote general happiness. Our capacity to estimate quantities and qualities of happiness is thus sufficiently good in order to conclude that a society that does protect “the most vital of all interests” (CW 10, 251) is better than a society that does not.

12. Freedom of Will

In various places of his work John Stuart Mill occupied himself with the question of the freedom of the human will. The respective chapter in the System ofLogic he later claimed was the best part of the entire book. Here Mill presents the solution to a problem with which he wrestled not only intellectually. In his Autobiography he calls it a “heavy burden” and reports: “I pondered painfully on the subject.” (CW 1, 177)

Freedom of the will is a traditional philosophical problem whose roots stretch back to antiquity. The problem results from the conflict of two positions: On the one hand, that all events – and thus also all actions – have causes from which they necessarily follow; on the other hand, that humans are free. Both claims cannot be reconciled, or so it seems, and this is the problem.

Mill is a determinist and assumes that human actions follow necessarilyfrom antecedent conditions and psychological laws. This apparently commits him to the claim that humans are not free; for if their actions occurred necessarily and inevitably, then they could not act otherwise. With perfect knowledge of antecedent conditions and psychological laws, we could predict human behavior with perfect accuracy.

But Mill is convinced that humans are free in a relevant sense. In modern terminology, this makes him a compatibilist, someone who believes in the reconcilability of determinism and free will. Part of his solution to the problem of compatibility is based on the discovery of a “misleading association”, which accompanies the word “necessity”. We have to differentiate between the following two statements: On the one hand, that actions occur necessarily; on the other hand, that they are predetermined and agents have no influence on them. Corresponding to this is the differentiation of the doctrine of necessity (determinism) and the doctrine of fatalism. Fatalism is indeed not compatible with human freedom, says Mill, but determinism is.

He grounds his thesis that determinism is reconcilable with a sense of human freedom, first, (i) with a repudiation of common misunderstandings regarding the content of determinism and, second, (ii) with a presentation of what he takes to be the appropriate concept of human freedom.

(i) With regard to human action, the “doctrine of necessity” claims that actions are determined by the external circumstances and the effective motives of the person at a given point in time. Causal necessity means that events are accompanied not only factually without exception by certain effects, but would also be under counter-factual circumstances. Given the preconditions and laws, it is necessary that a person acts in a certain way, and a well-informed observer would have predicted precisely this. As things were, this had to happen.

Fatalism advocates a completely different thesis. It claims that all essential events in life are fixed, regardless of antecedent conditions or psychological laws. Nothing could change their occurrence. If someone’s fate is to die on a particular day, there is no way of changing it. One finds this kind of fatalism in Sophocles “Oedipus”. Oedipus is destined to kill his father and marry his mother and his desperate attempts to avoid his foretold fate are in vain. The determinists of his day, Mill suggests, were “more or less obscurely” also fatalists – and he thought that this explains the predominance of the belief that human will can be free only if determinism is false.

(ii) Mill now turns to the question of whether determinism – correctly understood – is indeed incompatible with the doctrine of free will. His central idea is, firstly, that determinism in no way excludes the possibility that a person can influence his or her character; and secondly, that the ability to have influence on one’s own character is what we mean by free will.

(1) Actions are determined by one’s character and the prevailing external  circumstances. The character of a person is constituted by his or her motives, habits, convictions and so forth. All these are governed by psychological laws. A person’s character is not given at birth. It is being formed through education; the goals that we pursue, the motives and convictions that we have depend to a large degree on our socialization. But if it is possible to form someone’s character by means of education, then it is also possible to form one’s own character through self-education: “We are exactly as capable of making our own character, if we will, as others are of making it for us.”

If we have the wish to change ourselves, then we can. Experience teaches us that we are capable of having influence on our habits and attitudes. The desire to change oneself resides, for Mill, in the individual, thus in our selves. Discontent with oneself and one’s own life, or the admiration for another lifestyle may be reasons why one wants to change (CW 8, 841).

(2) The ability to influence the formation of one’s own character, for Mill, is the substance of the doctrine of free will: “(…) that what is really inspiring and ennobling in the doctrine of freewill, is the conviction that we have real power over the formation of our own character; that our will, by influencing some of our circumstances, can modify our future habits or capabilities of willing. All this was entirely consistent with the doctrine of circumstances, or rather, was that doctrine itself, properly understood.” (CW 1, 177). Nothing more is intended by the doctrine of free will: We are capable of acting in a way that corresponds to our own desires; and we are, if we want, capable of shaping our desires. More precisely said, Mill advocates the idea that we are in a measure free, insofar as we can become those who we want to be.

One may object here that Mill’s theory presumes the desire to change. But what about those who do not want to change? If one does not want to change, then one could not change. And with this, not all humans are free. But such an objection presumes that those who do not have the desire to change themselves are missing something (namely, the desire to change), and that, because of this lack, they are less free. But Mill contends that persons in certain ways “are their desires”. If someone is lacking the desire to change, he or she is no less free than a person who has this desire. It is not as if one were simply missing an entry upon a list of choices. The “I” does not choose between various desires and options; instead it is rather that “one’s self” is identified with one’s desires: “…it is obvious that ‘I’ am both parties in the contest; the conflict is between me and myself; between (for instance) me desiring a pleasure, and me dreading self-reproach. What causes Me, or, if you please, my Will, to be identified with one side rather than with the other, is that one of the Me’s represents a more permanent state of feelings than the other one does.” (CW 9, 452).

The thought that there is no “I” is also the reason why Mill rejects the idea that freedom presupposes the capacity to refrain from an act in a given situation (“I could have done otherwise”). Mill finds the idea utterly curious that someone’s will was only free if he could have acted differently. For what does it mean to say that “(o)ne could have acted differently?” Is it supposed to mean that one could have chosen what one did not want to choose (CW 9, 450)?According to Mill’s analysis, what we mean by the phrase (that we could have acted differently) is this: If the circumstances, or my character or my mood or my knowledge and so forth, would have been different, I would have acted differently. Without such variations, the thought that one could have acted differently seems strange to Mill:“I dispute therefore altogether that we are conscious of being able to act in opposition to the strongest present desire or aversion.” (CW 9, 453). Because a person cannot counteract an effective desire, he is necessarily determined by it – just as things are.

13. Responsibility and Punishment

Mill variously examines the thesis that punishment is only justified if the perpetrator could have acted differently. A contemporary of Mill’s, the social reformer Robert Owen, claimed that punishment of the breaking of social norms is unjustified, because the character of a person is the result of social influences. No one is the author of himself. Because actions follow from the character and one is not responsible for this, it is not just to punish people for the violation of norm which they could not help violating. It was not within their power to act differently. And it is unjust to punish someone for something, if he could not do anything to hinder its occurrence (CW 9, 453).

Mill responds to Owen’s criticism that persons could very well have influence on their characters, if they wanted. But does this satisfy us as a defence of punishment for the breaking of norms? It might be right that someone who does not want to change will not become depressed about his inability to change (CW 8, 841). Probably the thought will not even occur to him. But the point here is not whether one’s inability is a source of depression or not. The point is whether it is fair to punish people for actions which they could not control. If one lacks the respective desire, then one cannot change one’s character. It seems unfair to blame a person for her rotten character if there is no “I” that we can accuse of failing to have the desire to change.

Mill’s solution to this problem is somewhat surprising. We have to be clear as to what it means to say that a person “could not have acted differently”. Certainly, it does not mean that a person would have performed a particular act under all conceivable circumstances. This would be the case, if humans were programmed like robots to act in certain ways, regardless of the external conditions. In actual fact, one can in almost all cases imagine variations in circumstances that would effectively hold a person back from acting how he or she acted. Someone with criminal tendencies might not be able to keep himself from acting criminally, because he does not consider the possibility that he will be severely punished if caught. “If, on the contrary, the impression is strong in his mind that a heavy punishment will follow, he can, and in most cases does, help it.” (CW 9, 458)

It is the purpose of punishments to reduce anti-social behavior, in particular the violation of moral rights, “the most vital of all interests” (CW 10, 251). The justification of punishment consists in the fact that it serves this justified goal (CW 9, 459-460). If someone cannot be restrained from breaking the norm through the threat of punishment, then the threat of punishment was ineffective in regard to this individual. It was not enough – seen in the light of his character and his perception of the situation – to discourage him from violating the norm. But that the criminal inclinations of an individual is higher than average and that it had therefore needed a stronger incentive in order to bring him to respect the norm makes neither the punishment nor the threat of punishment unjust or illegitimate.

According to Mill, conceiving oneself as a morally responsible agent does not mean to see oneself as an “I” who could have acted differently. It means to consider oneself as member of a moral community entitled to sanction the violation of justified social norms. This idea of moral responsibility does not seem far-fetched. A person may well agree that it is appropriate to punish him for the violation of moral rights, even if he “could not have done otherwise” under the given circumstances.

14. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • Mill, John Stuart, The Collected Works of John Stuart Mill. Gen. Ed. John M. Robson. 33 vols. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1963-91.
    • The standard scholarly edition including Mill’s published works, letters, and notes; cited in the text as CW volume, page.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bain, Alexander, 1882, John Stuart Mill. A Criticism: With Personal Recollections, London: Longmans, Green, and Co.
  • Berger, Fred R., 1984, Happiness, Justice, and Freedom: The Moral and Political Philosophy of John Stuart Mill, Berkeley & Los Angeles: U. of California Press.
  • Bradley, Francis H., 1876/1988, Ethical Studies, reprint of the second edition, Oxford: OUP.
  • Brink, David, 1992, “Mill's Deliberative Utilitarianism”, in: Philosophy & Public Affairs 21, pp. 67-103.
  • Brown, D. G., 1973, “What is Mill’s Principle of Utility?”, in: Canadian Journal of Philosophy 3 (1), pp. 1-12.
  • Coope, Christopher M., 1998, “Was Mill a Utilitarian?”, Utilitas 10 (1), pp. 33-67.
  • Crisp, Roger, 1997, Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Mill on Utilitarianism, London: Routledge.
  • Donner, Wendy, 1991, The Liberal Self. John Stuart Mill’s Moral and Political Philosophy, Ithaca & London: Cornell UP.
  • Donner, Wendy & Richard Fumerton, 2009, Mill, Chichester: Wiley-Blackwell (Blackwell Great Minds).
  • Eggleston, Ben/Dale E. Miller/David Weinstein (eds.), 2011, John Stuart Mill and the Art of Life, Oxford: OUP.
  • Fuchs, Alan, 2006, “Mill’s Theory of Morally Correct Action”, in: The Blackwell Guide to Mill’s Utilitarianism, edited by Henry R. West, Oxford: Blackwell, 139-158.
  • Green, Thomas H., 1883/2003, Prolegomena to Ethics, edited by David O. Brink, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Grote, John, 1870, An Examination of the Utilitarian Philosophy, edited by Joseph Bickersteth, Cambridge: Deighton, Bell, and Co.
  • Lyons, David, 1978/1994, “Mill’s Theory of Justice, in: Rights, Welfare, and Mill's Moral Theory, Oxford: OUP, 67-88.
  • Lyons, David, 1994, Rights, Welfare, and Mill's Moral Theory, Oxford: OUP.
  • Miller, Dale E., 2010, J. S. Mill. Moral, Social and Political Thought, Cambridge: CUP.
  • Miller, Dale E., 2011, “Mill, Rule Utilitarianism, and the Incoherence Objection”, in: Eggleston, Ben/Dale E. Miller/David Weinstein (eds.), 2011, John Stuart Mill and the Art of Life, Oxford: OUP, 94-116.
  • Rawls, John, 1971/1999, A Theory of Justice. Revised Edition, Cambridge/Mass.: Belknap Press of HUP.
  • Rawls, John, 2008, Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy, edited by Samuel Freeman, Cambridge/Mass.: Belknap Press of HUP.
  • Reeves, Richard, 2007, John Stuart Mill. Victorian Firebrand, London: Atlantic Books.
  • Riley, Jonathan, 1988, Liberal Utilitarianism. Social Choice Theory and J. S. Mill's Philosophy, Cambridge: CUP.
  • Sayre-McCord, Geoffrey, 2001, “Mill's 'Proof' of the Principle of Utility: A More than Half-Hearted Defense”, in: Social Philosophy & Policy 18, 330-360.
  • Skorupski, John, 1989, John Stuart Mill. The Arguments of the Philosophers, London & New York: Routledge.
  • Skorupski, John, 2006, Why Read Mill Today? London & New York: Routledge.
  • Urmson, James O., 1953, “The Interpretation of the Moral Philosophy of J. S. Mill”, in: Philosophical Quarterly 3, pp. 33-39.
  • West, Henry R., 2004, An Introduction to Mill’s Ethics, Cambridge: CUP.


Author Information

Michael Schefczyk
Karlsruhe Institut für Technologie

The Yoga Sutras of Patanjali

The tradition of Patañjali in the oral and textual tradition of the Yoga Sūtras is accepted by traditional Vedic schools as the authoritative source on Yoga, and it retains this status in Hindu circles into the present day. In contrast to its modern Western transplanted forms, Yoga essentially consists of meditative practices culminating in attaining a state of consciousness free from all modes of active or discursive thought, and of eventually attaining a state where consciousness is unaware of any object external to itself, that is, is only aware of its own nature as consciousness unmixed with any other object. This state is not only desirable in its own right, but its attainment guarantees the practitioner freedom from every kind of material pain or suffering, and, indeed, is the primary classical means of attaining liberation from the cycle of birth and death in the Indic soteriological traditions, that is, in the theological study of salvation in India. The Yoga Sūtras were thus seen by all schools, not only as the orthodox manual for guidance in the techniques and practices of meditation, but also for the classical Indian position on the nature and function of mind and consciousness, for the mechanisms of action in the world and consequent rebirth, and for the metaphysical underpinnings and description of the attainment of mystical powers.

Table of Contents

  1. Background and Author
  2. Metaphysics
  3. Philosophy and Psychology of Mind
  4. Soteriology and Praxis
  5. Epistemology
  6. Ethics
  7. Theism
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Background and Author

In terms of literary sources, there is evidence as early as the oldest Vedic text, the Ṛg Veda (c. 1200 - c. 1500 B.C.E.), that there were yogī-like ascetics on the margins of the Vedic world. In terms of the archaeological record, seals found in Indus Valley sites (c. 3000 - c. 1500 B.C.E.) with representations of figures seated in a clear yogic posture (the most famous figure is seated in padmāsana, lotus pose, with arms extended and resting on the knees in a classical meditative posture), suggest that, irrespective of its literary origins, Yoga has been practiced on the Indian subcontinent for well over 4000 years. However, it is in the late Vedic age, marked by the fertile speculations expressed in a genre of texts called the Upaniṣads (c. 800 - c. 600 B.C.E.), that practices that can be clearly related to classical Yoga are first articulated in literary sources.

While the Upaniṣads are especially concerned with jñāna, or understanding Brahman, the Absolute Truth, through the cultivation of knowledge, there are also several unmistakable references to a technique for realizing Brahman (in its localized aspect of ātman) called Yoga. As with the Upaniṣads in general, we do not find a systematic philosophy here, but mystico-poetic utterances, albeit profound in content (Kaṭha Upaniṣad VI.11–18; Śvetāśvatara Upaniṣad II.8–15; Maitrī Upaniṣad VI.18). The Mahābhārata Epic, which is the largest literary epic in the world, also preserves significant material representing the evolution of Yoga, indeed, the term “yoga” and “yogī occur about 900 times throughout the Epic. Usually dated somewhere between the 9th–4th centuries C.E., the Epic exhibits the transition between the origins of Yoga in the Upaniṣadic period and its expression in the systematized traditions of Yoga as represented in the classical period by Patañjali. Nestled in the middle of the Epic, the well-known Bhagavad Gītā (c. 4th century B.C.E.), devotes a good portion of its bulk to the practices of Yoga, which it considers to be “ancient” (IV.3).

This, of course, indicates that practices associated with Yoga had gained wide currency in the centuries prior to the common era, with a clearly identifiable set of basic techniques and generic practices, and we will here simply allude to the fact that scholars have long pointed out a commonality of vocabulary, and concepts between the Yoga Sūtras (YS) and Buddhist texts. All this underscores the fact that there was a cluster of numerous interconnected and cross-fertilizing variants of meditational YogaBuddhist and Jain as well as Hindu – prior to Patañjali, all drawn from a common but variegated pool of terminologies, practices and concepts (and, indeed, many strains continue to the present day). Of closer relevance to the Sūtras is the fact that the history of Yoga is inextricable from that of the Sāṁkhya tradition. Sāṁkhya provides the metaphysical infrastructure for Yoga (discussed in the section on metaphysics), and thus is indispensable to an understanding of Yoga. While both Yoga and Sāṁkhya share the same metaphysics and the common goal of liberating purua from its encapsulation, their methods differ.

Sāṁkhya occupies itself with the path of reasoning to attain liberation, specifically concerning itself with the analysis of the manifold ingredients of prakti from which the purua was to be extricated, and Yoga more with the path of meditation, focusing its attention on the nature of mind and consciousness, and the techniques of concentration in order to provide a practical method through which the purua can be isolated and extricated. Sāṁkhya seems to have been perhaps the earliest philosophical system to have taken shape in the late Vedic period, and has permeated almost all subsequent Hindu traditions; indeed the classical Yoga of Patañjali has been seen as a type of neo-Sāṁkhya, updating the old Sāṁkhya tradition to bring it into conversation with the more technical philosophical traditions that had emerged by the 3–5th centuries C.E., particularly Buddhist thought. In fact, Sāṁkhya and Yoga should not be considered different schools until a very late date: the first reference to Yoga itself as a distinct school seems to be in the writings of Śaṅkara in the 9th century C.E. Yoga and Sāṁkhya in the Upaniṣads and Epic simply refer to the two distinct paths of salvation by meditation and salvation by knowledge, respectively.

One might add, as an aside, that from the 900-odd references to Yoga in the Mahābhārata, there are only two mentions of āsana, posture, the third limb of Patañjali’s system. Neither the Upaniṣads nor the Gītā mention posture in the sense of stretching exercises and bodily poses (the term is used as “seat” rather than bodily postures), and Patañjali himself only dedicates three brief sūtras from his text to this aspect of the practice. The reconfiguring, presentation and perception of Yoga as primarily or even exclusively āsana in the sense of bodily poses, then, is essentially a modern Western phenomenon and finds no precedent in the premodern Yoga tradition. From this rich and fertile post-Vedic context, then, emerged an individual called Patañjali whose systematization of the heterogeneous practices of Yoga came to be authoritative for all subsequent practitioners and his system eventually reified into one of the six schools of classical Indian philosophy. It is important to stress here that Patañjali is not the founder or inventor of Yoga, the origins of which, as noted above, had long preceded him in primordial and mythic times.  Patañjali systematized the preexisting traditions and authored what came to be the seminal text for Yoga discipline. There was never one uniform school of Yoga, or Ur-Yoga (or of any Indic school of thought for that matter): there was a plurality of variants, and certainly different conceptualizations of meditative practices that were termed Yoga. For example, while Patañjali organizes his system into eight limbs, and the Mahābhārata, too, speaks of Yoga as having eight “qualities” (aṣṭaguṇita, XII.304.7), as early as in the Maitrī Upaniṣad of the 2nd century B.C.E., there is reference to a six-limbed Yoga (VI.18), as there is in the Viṣṇu Purāṇa (VI.7.91). Along similar lines, there are various references to the twelve yogas and seven dhāraṇās (dhāraṇā is considered the sixth of Patañjali’s limbs) found in the Epic Mahābhārata. Yoga is thus best understood as a cluster of techniques, some more and some less systematized, that pervaded the landscape of ancient India. These overlapped and were incorporated into the various traditions of the day such as the jñāna, knowledge-based traditions, providing these systems with a practical method and technique for attaining an experienced-based transformation of consciousness. Patañjali’s particular systematization of these techniques was in time to emerge as the most dominant, but by no means exclusive, version.

Indeed, internal to his own text, in his very first sūtra, atha yoga anuśāsanam, Patañjali indicates that he is continuing the teachings of Yoga (the verbal prefix anu indicates the continuation of the action denoted by the verb), and the traditional commentators certainly perceive him in this light. In point of fact, the tradition itself ascribes the actual origins of Yoga to the legendary figure Hiraṇyagarbha. Moreover, evidence that Patañjali was addressing an audience already familiar with the tenets of Yoga can be deduced from the Yoga Sūtras themselves. For example, on occasion, Patañjali will mention one member of a list of items followed by “etc.,”, thereby assuming his audience to be familiar with the remainder of the list. But, in short, because he produced the first systematized treatise on the subject, Patañjali was to become the prime or seminal figure for the Yoga tradition after his times, and was accepted as such by other schools. To all intents and purposes, his Yoga Sūtras were to become the canon for the mechanics of generic Yoga, so to speak, that other systems tinkered with, and flavored with their own theological trappings.

As with the reputed founders of the other schools of thought, very little is known about Patañjali himself. Tradition, first evidenced in the commentary of Bhoja Rāja in the 11th century C.E., considers him to be the same Patañjali who wrote the primary commentary on the famous grammar by Pāṇini, and also ascribes to him authorship of a treatise on medicine. There is an ongoing discussion amongst scholars as to whether this was likely or not, but there is not much to be gained by challenging the evidence of traditional accounts in the absence of alternative evidence to the contrary that is uncontroversial or at least adequately compelling.

Patañjali’s date can only be inferred from the content of the text itself. Unfortunately, as with most classical Sanskrit texts from the ancient period, early Sanskrit texts tend to be impossible to date with accuracy, and there are always dissenters against whatever dates become standard in academic circles. Most scholars seem to date the text shortly after the turn of the common era, (c. 1st – c. 2nd century C.E.), but it has been placed as early as several centuries before the common era. Other than the fact that the text does not postdate the 5th century C.E., the date of the Yoga Sūtras cannot be determined with exactitude.

The Sūtra writing style is that used by the philosophical schools of ancient India (thus we have Vedānta Sūtras, Nyāya Sūtras, etc.). The term “sūtra,” (from the Sanskrit root , cognate with “sew”) literally means a thread, and essentially refers to a terse and pithy philosophical statement in which the maximum amount of information is packed into the minimum amount of words. Knowledge systems were handed down orally in ancient India, and thus source material was kept minimal partly with a view to facilitating memorization. Being composed for oral transmission and memorization, the Yoga Sūtras, and sūtra traditions in general, allowed the student to “thread together” in memory the key ingredients of the more extensive body of material with which the student would become thoroughly acquainted. Thus, each sūtra served as a mnemonic device to structure the teachings and facilitate memorization, almost like a bullet point that would then be elaborated upon.

This very succinctness – the Yoga Sūtras contain about 1200 words in 195 sūtras – and the fact that the sūtras are in places cryptic, esoteric and incomprehensible in their own terms points to the fact that they served as manuals to be used in conjunction with a teacher. Therefore, it is an unrealistic (if not impossible) task to attempt to bypass commentary in the hope of retrieving some original pure, pre-commentarial set of Ur-interpretations

Knowledge systems in ancient Indian were transmitted orally, from master to disciple, with an enormous emphasis on fidelity towards the original set of Sūtras upon which the system is founded, the master unpacking the dense and truncated aphorisms to the students.  Periodically, teachers of particular prominence wrote commentaries on the primary texts of many of these knowledge systems. Some of these gained wide currency to the point that the primary text was always studied in conjunction with a commentary, particularly since texts such as the Yoga Sūtras were designed to be unpacked because they contain numerous sūtras that are incomprehensible without further elaboration. One cannot overstress, therefore, that our understanding of Patañjali’s text is completely dependent on the interpretations of later commentators: it is incomprehensible, in places, in its own terms.

In terms of the overall accuracy of the commentaries there is an a priori likelihood that the interpretations of the Sūtras were faithfully preserved and transmitted orally through the few generations from Patañjali until the first commentary by Vyāsa in the 5th Century C.E. Certainly, the commentators from Vyāsa onwards are remarkably consistent in their interpretations of the essential metaphysics of the system for over fifteen hundred years, which is in marked contrast with the radical differences in essential metaphysical understanding distinguishing commentators of the Vedānta school (a Rāmānuja or a Madhva from a Śaṅkara, for example). While the 15th century commentator Vijñānabhikṣu, for example, may not infrequently quibble with the 9th century commentator Vācaspati Miśra, the differences generally are in detail, not essential metaphysical elements. And while Vijñānabhikṣu may inject a good deal of Vedāntic concepts into the basic dualism of the Yoga system, this is generally an addition (conspicuous and identifiable) to the system rather than a reinterpretation of it. There is thus a remarkably consistent body of knowledge associated with the Yoga school for the best part of a millennium and a half, and consequently one can speak of “the traditional understanding” of the Sūtras in the premodern period without overly generalizing or essentializing.

The first extant commentary by the legendary Vyāsa, typically dated to around the 4–5th century C.E., was to attain a status almost as canonical as the primary text by Patañjali himself. Consequently, the study of the Yoga Sūtras has always been embedded in the commentary that tradition attributes to this greatest of literary figures. Practically speaking, when we speak of the philosophy of Patañjali, what we really mean (or should mean) is the understanding of Patañjali according to Vyāsa: it is Vyāsa who determined what Patañjali’s abstruse Sūtras meant, and all subsequent commentators elaborated on Vyāsa. The Vyāsa Bhāṣya (commentary) becomes inseparable from the Sūtras; an extension of it.  From one sūtra of a few words, Vyāsa might write several lines of comment without which the sūtra remains incomprehensible. Vyāsa’s commentary, the Bhāṣya, thus attains the status of canon, and is almost never questioned by any subsequent commentator. Subsequent commentators base their commentaries on unpacking Vyāsa’s Bhāṣya – rarely critiquing it, but rather expanding or elaborating upon it. It is this point of reference that produces a marked uniformity in the interpretation of the Sūtras in the pre-modern period.

The next commentary is called the Vivaraṇa, attributed to the great Vedāntin Śaṅkara in the 8th – 9th century C.E. It has remained unresolved since it was first questioned in 1927 whether the commentary on the Yoga Sūtras assigned to Śaṅkara is authentically penned by him. The next best known commentator is Vācaspati Miśra, whose commentary, the Tattvavai Śāradī, can be dated with more security to the 9th century C.E.  Vācaspati Miśra was a prolific intellectual, penning important commentaries on the Vedānta, Sāṁkhya, Nyāya and Mīmāṁsā schools in addition to his commentary on the Yoga Sūtras, and was noteworthy for his ability to present each tradition in its own terms, without displaying any overt personal predilection.

A fascinating Arabic translation of Patañjali’s Sūtras was undertaken by the famous Arab traveler and historian al-Bīrunī (973–1050 C.E.), the manuscript of which was discovered in Istanbul in the 1920’s. Roughly contemporaneous with al-Bīrunī is the 11th century King Bhoja, poet, scholar and patron of the arts, sciences and esoteric traditions, in whose commentary, called the Rājamārtaṇ∂a, there are on occasion very valuable insights to be found. In the 15th century, Vijñānabhikṣu wrote a most insightful and useful commentary after that of Vyāsa’s, the Yogavārttika. Vijñānabhikṣu was another prolific scholar, noteworthy for his attempt to harmonize Vedānta and Sāṁkhya concepts. In the 16th century C.E., another Vedāntin, Rāmānanda Sarasvatī, wrote his commentary, called Yogamaṇiprabhā, which also adds little to the previous commentaries. But there are valuable insights contained in the Bhāsvatī by Hariharānanda Āraṇya, written in Bengali, from a context nearer our own times, a standpoint exposed to Western thought, but still thoroughly grounded in tradition. While many other commentaries have been written, these are the primary commentaries written in the pre-modern era. The commentaries written in the modern period, many of which have made massive adjustments to modernity or the sensitivities of the Western market, are beyond the scope of this discussion, which limits itself to classical Yoga philosophy.

The Yoga Sūtras is divided into four padas, chapters. The first, samādhi pāda, defines Yoga as the complete cessation of all active states of mind, and outlines various stages of insight that stem from this. The chapter points to the ultimate goal of Yoga, which is content-less awareness, beyond even the most supreme stages of insight. The second, sādhana pāda, outlines the various practices, and moral and ethical observances that are preliminary requirements to serious meditative practice. The third, vibhūti pada, primarily deals with various super-normal powers that can accrue to the practitioner when the mind is in extreme states of concentration. There seems to have been a widespread culture in ancient India of engaging in Yoga-like practices but not in pursuit of the real goal of Yoga as defined by Patañjali, but rather in quest of such super-normal powers; this chapter can be read as Patañjali’s warning against being side-tracked in this way. The fourth, kaivalya pāda deals with liberation, and, amongst other things, contains Patañjali’s response to the Buddhist challenge.

2. Metaphysics

As noted, Yoga is not to be considered as a school distinct from Sāṁkhya until well after Patañjali’s time, but rather as a different approach or method towards enlightenment, although there are minor differences. Sāṁkhya provides the metaphysical or theoretical basis for the realization of purua, and Yoga the technique or practice itself.  While the Yoga tradition does not agree with the Sāṁkhya view that metaphysical analysis, that is, jñāna, knowledge, constitutes a sufficient path towards enlightenment in and of itself the metaphysical presuppositions of the Yoga system assume those of Sāṁkhya. Leaving aside the numerous variants of Sāṁkhya (the Chinese Buddhist pilgrim Hsöen Tsang’s disciple in the 7th century C.E. reports 18 schools, and the loss of the earlier material, the later khya Kārikā of Iśvarakṛṣṇa (4th–5th century C.E.), has by default become the seminal text of the tradition, just as Patañjali’s Yoga Sūtras has for the Yoga tradition.

In the generic Sāṁkhya (literally “numeration”) system, the universe of animate and inanimate entities is perceived as ultimately the product of two ontologically distinct categories; hence this system is quintessentially dvaita, or dualistic in presupposition. These two categories are prakti, or the primordial material matrix of the physical universe, and purua, the innumerable conscious selves embedded within it. As a result of the interaction between these two entities, the material universe evolves in a series of stages. The actual catalysts in this evolutionary process are the three guas, literally “strands” or “qualities,” which are inherent in prakti. These are: sattva, “lucidity;” rajas, “action;” and tamas, “inertia.” These guas are sometimes compared to the threads which underpin the existence of a rope; just as a rope is actually a combination of threads, so all manifest reality actually consists of a combination of the guas.

Given the meditative focus of the text, the guas are especially significant to Yoga in terms of their psychological manifestation; in Yoga, the mind and therefore all psychological dispositions, are prakti, and therefore also comprised of the guas – the only difference between mind and matter being that the former has a larger preponderance of sattva, and the latter of tamas. Therefore, according to the specific intermixture and proportionality of the guas, living beings exhibit different types of mindsets and psychological dispositions. Thus, when sattva is predominant in an individual, the qualities of lucidity, tranquility, wisdom, discrimination, detachment, happiness, and peacefulness manifest; when rajas is predominant, hankering, attachment, energetic endeavor, passion, power, restlessness and creative activity; and when tamas, the gua least favorable for yoga, is predominant, ignorance, delusion, disinterest, lethargy, sleep, and disinclination towards constructive activity.

The guas are continually interacting and competing with each other, one gua becoming prominent for a while and overpowering the others, only to be eventually dominated in turn by the increase of one of the other guas. They are compared to the wick, fire and oil of the lamp which, while opposed to each other in their nature, come together to produce light. Just as there are an unlimited variety of colors stemming from the intermixture of the three primary colors, different hues being simply expressions of the specific proportionality of red, yellow and blue, so the unlimited psychological dispositions of living creatures (and of physical forms) stem from the intermixture of the guas; specific states of mind being reflections of the particular proportionality of the intermixture of the three guas.

The guas not only underpin the philosophy of mind in Yoga, but the activation and interaction of these gua qualities result in the production of the entirety of physical forms that also evolve from the primordial material matrix, prakti, under the same principle. Thus the physical composition of objects like air, water, stone, fire, etc. differs because of their constitutional makeup of specific guas: air contains more of the buoyancy of sattva, stones more of the sluggishness of the tamas element, and fire, of rajas. The guas allow for the infinite plasticity of prakti and the objects of the world.

The process by which the universe evolves from prakti is usefully compared to the churning of milk: when milk receives a citric catalyst, yogurt, curds, or butter emerge. These immediate products, in turn, can be further manipulated to produce a further series of products – milk desserts, cheese, etc. Similarly, according to classical Sāṁkhya, the first evolute emerging from prakti when it is churned by the guas (sattva specifically) is buddhi, intelligence. Intelligence is characterized by the functions of judgment, discrimination, knowledge, ascertainment, will, virtue and detachment, and sattva is predominant in it. This means that in its purest state, when the potential of rajas and tamas are minimized, buddhi is primarily lucid, peaceful, happy, tranquil and discriminatory, all qualities of sattva. It is the interface between purua and all other praktic evolutes. From this vantage point, it can direct awareness out into the objects and embroilments of the world, or, in its highest potential, it can become aware of the presence of purua and consequently redirect itself towards complete realization of the true source of consciousness that pervades it.

From buddhi, ahakāra, or ego is produced (aham “I” + kāra “doing;” referred to as asmitā in this text). This is characterized by the function of self-awareness and self-identity. It is the discursive aspect that processes and appropriates external reality from the perspective of an individualized sense of self or ego – the notion of “I” and “mine” in human awareness. Ahakāra also limits the range of awareness to fit within and identify with the contours of the particular psychophysical organism within which it finds itself in any one embodiment, as opposed to another. In other words, the ahakāra of a typical, unenlightened, bug acts almost like a concave screen, which refracts consciousness to pervade and appropriate the contours of the bug. If the bug dies and becomes, say, a typical, unenlightened dog and then a typical human in subsequent lives, the ahakāra aspect of the citta adjusts to accommodate and absorb consciousness into these new environments.  Thus the bug thinks it is a bug, the dog thinks it is a dog, and the human thinks he or she is a human.

When ego in turn is “churned” by the guṇa of sattva inherent in it, manas, the mind, is produced. The mind is the seat of the emotions, of like and dislike, and is characterized by controlling the senses – filtering and processing the potentially enormous amount of data accessible to the senses. It primarily receives, sorts, categorizes and then transmits. It serves as the liaison between the activities of the senses transmitting data from the external world, and buddhi, intelligence. It therefore partakes both of internal and external functioning: internally, it is characterized by reflective synthesis, while simultaneously being a sense because it acts similar to the senses. The puruṣa, or self, is cloaked in these psychic layers prior to receiving a gross body and senses. The Yoga school, while using the terminology of (especially) buddhi, but also ahaṁkāra and manas, differs somewhat from that of Sāṁkhya in conceiving these three as interacting functions of the one citta, mind, rather than as three distinct metaphysical layers. Citta, then, as the term used by Patañjali and the commentators to refer to all three of these cognitive functions combined, is one of the most important terms in the Yoga Sūtras.

3. Philosophy and Psychology of Mind

Yoga is defined by Patañjali as “citta vtti nirodha” (YS I.2), the stilling of all states of the citta. There are five vttis, a term used frequently throughout the Yoga Sūtras to essentially refer to any sensual impression, thought, idea, or cognition, psychic activity or conscious mental state whatsoever. These five vttis are: right knowledge, error, metaphor, deep sleep and memory (YS I.5-11). They are either kliṣṭa, detrimental to the goal of Yoga, or akliṣṭa, conducive to it. The kliṣṭa vttis are those stemming from the mind when it is subject to the five kleśas, obstacles – ignorance, ego, desire, aversion, clinging to life – discussed below, and the akliṣṭa vttis are those stemming from their opposites – knowledge of the true self and freedom from desire, etc. Put simply, akliṣṭa vttis are the mental activities of a jivanmukta, a being who is liberated while still embodied.

The first of these five vttis is epistemological, pramāa, that is, the sources that constitute the production of valid knowledge of an object - the methods of attaining accurate information about reality. This is discussed in the section on epistemology, and we will simply note here that the first vtti is when the mind is in a state of right knowledge, that is, is accurately reflecting external reality (Yoga would not disagree with the basics of the Nyāya tradition as to what constitutes right knowledge, nor with the criteria that produce it). The second vtti is error, which can be produced from the same sources as knowledge, and is defined as considering something to be what it is not, a state that can be subsequently removed by true knowledge of what the nature of the thing in question is (such as the perception of two moons when in an intoxicated state).

The third type of vtti is, loosely speaking, imagination or metaphor, or, more precisely, the usage of words or expressions that do not correspond to any actual physical reality, but that are understood in common parlance. An example given in the commentaries is the statement that “the arrow stands still, stood still, will stand still.” What this actually means in the mind of the listener is that the arrow has ceased (or will cease) to move, that is, “standing still,” the absence of motion, is really an imagined state of affairs dependent on the idea of motion, but it is then projected as an actual characteristic of the arrow. A more straightforward example from English usage might be: “the sun rises and sets” or “time flies;” common usage has assigned meaning to these imaginary states of affairs, and no one bats an eyelid when such expressions are uttered. In fact, metaphors and similes, which, if dissected to their literal meanings do not correspond to actual objective reality, are normal everyday expressions and ubiquitous in human language, since language is largely figurative.

The fourth vtti is deep sleep defined as a state of mind which is based on an absence [of any content]. There is some difference between schools but (in contrast to e.g. Vedānta), the Yoga tradition views deep sleep as a type of vtti on the grounds that when one awakes, one remembers that one has either slept well, or slept restlessly, or slept in a stupor. One would not be able to do so if these impressions did not relate back to a state of mind that existed during deep sleep. This is because, in Yoga psychology, memory is the product of saskāra, and saskāra is caused by experience. Therefore, the memory of having slept well must relate to a state of mind experienced during deep sleep, which is recorded in the citta as memory (the topic of the next sūtra) and remembered upon awakening. This state of mind according to this line of reasoning must therefore pertain to a category of vtti distinct from others.

Finally, the fifth vtti is memory, defined as the retention of images of sense objects that have been experienced. Any vtti leaves its copy on the citta before fading away. Memories are generated from and thus depend on the other types of vttis. As noted earlier, every object that has ever been experienced forms a saskāra, an imprint, in the citta mind, like a sound is imprinted on a tape recorder, or an image on film. The mind forms an impression of an object through the sense organs, which is called a pratyaya. Once this pratyaya or active image of this object is no longer of active interest to the mind, it becomes an inactive, or latent, saskāra. Thus vttis, and their pratyaya content, are retained as saskāras when they fade. Memory consists of the retrieval of these saskāras; memories are the reactivation of the imprints of sense objects that one has experienced and recognized in the past that are not too covered by forgetfulness (tamas). However, it is important to note that these saskāras are not just passive imprints but vibrant latent impulses that can get activated under conducive circumstances and can exert influence on a person’s thoughts and behaviors.

The notion of the subconscious in Western psychology corresponds to other less retrievable saskāras, primarily from previous lives, which remain latent as subliminal impressions. The mind is thus a storehouse of these recorded saskāras, deposited and accumulated in the citta over countless lifetimes. Saskāras also account for such things as personality traits, habits, compulsive and addictive behaviors, etc. The stronger or more dominant a cluster of saskāras becomes, the more it activates and imposes itself upon the consciousness of the individual, demanding indulgence and perpetuating a vicious cycle that can be very hard to break (the reverse, of course, also holds true with the benevolent akliṣṭa vttis discussed below: one can become “addicted,” so to speak, to benevolent yogic activities and lifestyle by dint of constant repetition).

Any other states of mind that one might conceive of would be considered by the Yoga tradition as a subset of one of these five essential categories. Since the mind is never static but always active and changing, vttis are constantly being produced, and thus constantly absorb the consciousness of purua away from its own pure nature, channeling it out into the realm of subtle or gross prakti.

As noted above, these five categories of vttis can be either akliṣṭa, conducive (at least initially) to the ultimate goal of Yoga, or kliṣṭa, detrimental. These participial terms assume an awareness of their nominal form, kleśa; there are five kleśas: ignorance, ego, desire, aversion and clinging to life (YS II.3-9). These kleśas are deeper elements of the psyche than their surface level manifestations as vttis. In resonance with all Indic soteriological thought, the first kleśa, ignorance, is the foundation of all the other kleśas, and hence of sasāra, so when ignorance is dispelled, the other kleśas, which may exist in latent unconscious form, or in various stages of consciousness, disappear. It is defined as follows: “Ignorance is the notion which takes the self, which is joyful, pure and eternal, to be the non-self, which is painful, unclean and temporary.” The “non-self,” an-ātman, consists not only of the body, which is the locus for enjoyment; and the mind, which is an instrument through which the awareness of purua can contact the world; but also the accessories or paraphernalia of the body, whether animate (such as spouse, animals, and offspring), or inanimate (such as furniture or food).

Ego is to consider the nature of the seer and the nature of the instrumental power of seeing to be the same thing. In other words, ego is the specific aspect of ignorance which identifies the non-self – specifically the intelligence – with the true self, purua (ātman). Ego and ignorance are to some extent the same thing, but there is a difference in degree. Ignorance initially involves a not-as-yet specific notion of “I-ness,” a sense of self as being something other than purua as yet undefined, a partial identification of the real self with buddhi, the intelligence, while ego involves a more developed or complete identity between the purua self and buddhi. The difference is one of degree; ego evolves out of ignorance, and makes the misidentification of non-self with self more concrete and specific.

Moving on to the third kleśa: the hankering, desire or craving for pleasure or the means to attain pleasure by one who remembers past experiences of pleasure, is attachment, rāga. The key ingredient in this process is memory. In other words, one who has experienced pleasure in the past recollects it and hankers to repeat the experience in the present or future, or to attain the means of repeating the experience. It is this dwelling on past experiences that constitutes “attachment.” When a new means of pleasure is perceived, it is memory that infers that the new means of pleasure is the same as or similar to something that produced pleasure in the past, and therefore promises to provide the same or similar pleasure in the present or future.

The fourth kleśa can be understood in a parallel manner to the previous kleśa of attachment: the feeling of resistance, anger, frustration and resentment towards pain and its causes by one who remembers past experiences of similar pain, is aversion. The tendency of clinging-to-life is the fifth kleśa which is taken to be a synonym for the fear of death.  Just as the previous sūtras indicated that attachment or aversion to something is caused by positive or negative memories of that thing, aversion to death likewise indicates that one’s memory retains unpleasant recollections of past deaths, although these are latent or subconscious in the present life.

When under the influence of the detrimental vttis stemming from the kleśas, the mind becomes attracted or repelled by sense objects drawing its attention. In its attempt to attain that which attracts it, that is, to fulfill desires, and avoid that which repels it, avoid aversions, the mind provokes action, karma, which initiates a vicious reactive cycle. Karma, from the root k, to “do” or “make,” literally means “work,” but inherent in the Indic concept of work, or any type of activity, is the notion that every action breeds a reaction. Thus karma refers not only to an initial act, whether benevolent or malicious, but also to the reaction it produces (pleasant or unpleasant in accordance with the original act) which ripens for the actor either in this life or a future one. Hence people are born into different socio-economic situations, and pleasant or unpleasant things happen to them throughout life in accordance with their own previous actions.

This cycle of action and reaction, or sasāra, is potentially eternal and unlimited since not only does any one single act breed a reaction, but the actor must then react to this reaction causing a re-reaction, which in turn fructifies and provokes re-re-reactions, and so on ad infinitum. Since these reactions and re-reactions, etc., cannot possibly be fitted into one life, they spill over from one lifetime to the next. It is in an attempt to portray the sheer unlimited and eternal productive power of karma that Indic thinkers, both Hindu and Buddhist, use such metaphors as “the ocean” of birth and death. Thus, karma, which keeps consciousness bound to the external world and forgetful of its own nature, is generated by the vttis, and the vttis, in turn, are produced by the kleśas. There is thus a cycle of kleśas, vttis and saskāras: vttis, that is thoughts, etc. stemming form sense experience, (and their consequent actions) are recorded in the citta as saskāras, and these saskāras eventually activate consciously or subliminally, producing further vttis. These vttis then provoke action with their corresponding reactions noted above, which in turn are recorded as saskāras, and the cycle continues. Kleśas, vttis, saskāras and karma are thus all interconnected links in the chain of sasāra.

The akliṣṭa non-detrimental mental vṛttis, on the other hand, are produced by the sāttvic faculty of discrimination that seeks to control the influence of rajas and tamas and thereby the detrimental vṛttis that they produce. Through the practice of yoga, the yogī attempts to supplant all the rājasic and tāmasic saṁskāras with sāttvic ones until these, too, are restricted in the higher states of meditative concentration — the notions of detrimental and non-detrimental are from the relative perspective of saṁsāra; the detrimental (rājasic and tāmasic) vṛttis cause pain, and the non-detrimental (sāttvic) ones at least lead in the direction of liberation, even though they too must eventually be given up. But these latter do point to the possibility of acting in the world, in one’s prakṛtic body and mind, from an enlightened perspective free from ignorance. This points to the notion of the jīvanmukta: someone who is still embodied and thus functioning with a citta, but a citta that generates vṛttis that are not subject to ignorance, ego, and attachment, etc.

4. Soteriology and Praxis

We have discussed that ignorance is the cause of suffering and sasāra, and that when this is removed by discrimination, liberation is attained. The core project of the Sūtras, then, is to outline how to accomplish this. The second chapter, kriyā yoga, is dedicated to this effect, featuring the eight limbs of yoga, that is, to the means of achieving discriminative discernment. The eight limbs are: yamas, abstentions; niyamas, observances; āsana, posture; prāāyāma, breath control; pratyahāra disengagement of the senses; dharaā, concentration, dhyāna, meditation and samādhi, absorption.

The yamas are: non-violence, truthfulness; refrainment from stealing; celibacy; and renunciation of [unnecessary] possessions. The first of these, ahi, non-violence, is the yama singled out by the commentators on Patañjali for special attention, indeed, as the root of the other yamas. Patañjali’s goal is to achieve ahi and enhance it. Ahi is defined as not injuring any living creature anywhere at any time. Truth, the second yama, is defined as one’s words and thoughts being in exact correspondence to fact. “Refrainment from stealing”, the third yama, is described as not taking things belonging to others, and not even harboring the desire to do so. Celibacy is the control of the sexual organs, a definition further refined as not seeing, speaking with, embracing, or otherwise interacting with members of the opposite sex as objects of desire. Renunciation of possessions is the ability to see the problems caused by the acquisition, preservation and destruction of things, since these only provoke attachment and injury. These yamas are considered the great vow. They are not exempted by one’s class, place, time or circumstance. They are universal.

The niyamas, observances, are: cleanliness, contentment, austerity, study [of scripture], and devotion to God. Cleanliness is external and internal; the former pertains to the body, and the latter to purifying the mind of all contamination (jealousy, pride, vanity, hatred and attachment.) “Contentment,” santoa, the second niyama, manifests as disinterest in accumulating more than one’s immediate needs of life. “Austerity,” tapas, is the ability to tolerate the urge to eat and drink, as well as the urge for the dualities of life – hot and cold, etc., to avoid useless talk, and to perform fasts. “Study,” svādhyāya, refers to reading sacred scriptures whose subject matter is liberation, and also includes the repetition of the om syllable. The last item on Patañjali’s list, “devotion to God,” śvara-praidhāna, includes offering all one’s activities to śvara, the “original teacher,” (YS I.26), without desire for the fruit. This last niyama will be discussed further in the section on theism.

With regards to the third limb of Yoga, the term “āsana” is hardly found in the older texts, except on occasion in the sense of a “seat.” Although the entirety of Yoga is typically understood and presented as āsana, physical posture, in the popular representations of the term in the West, it is actually only the third limb of Yoga, not an end or goal unto itself. Indeed, given that he dedicated 20 sūtras to the yamas and niyamas, Patañjali has relatively little to say about āsana, leaving us with only three sūtras to the topic consisting of a total of nine words – less than 1% of the text.

Vyāsa, the main commentator, knew of a range of āsanas in the 5th century C.E. (listing 12 followed by “etc.”, suggesting a well known tradition of variants). Nonetheless, essentially, posture is a limb of the actual goal of Yoga to the extent that it allows the meditator to sit “firmly,” sthira, and “comfortably,” sukha, for meditation. Indeed, as noted, āsana in fact literally means “seat.” The point is that yogic postures are useful only to the extent to which they facilitate fixing the mind completely by training the body not to be a source of distraction. Prāāyāma, breath control, consists of the regulation of the incoming and outgoing breaths. It is defined as the external, internal and restrained movements [of breath], which are drawn out and subtle in accordance to place, time and number. Pratyāhāra, the fifth limb, is defined as withdrawal from sense objects.

This process of consecutive stages of internalization seen in these first five limbs, then, continues throughout the remaining three limbs. The fifth limb, dhāraā, concentration, involves fixing the mind on one place. Although Patañjali allows that any object can be used as the support of the mind in dhāraā, theistic meditation comes highly recommended (see section on Theism). The seventh limb, meditation, is the one-pointedness of the mind on one image. More specifically, it consists of the continuous flow of the same thought or image of the object of meditation, without being distracted by any other thought. When the image of the object of meditation “flows” uninterrupted in the mind, that is to say when the mind can focus exclusively on that object without any other distraction, the seventh limb of Yoga, dhyāna, has been achieved. The sixth and seventh limbs of Yoga, as well as the eighth, are not different practices as is the case with the previous five limbs, but a continuation and deepening of the same practice.


Samādhi, the final limb, is when that same dhyāna shines forth as the object alone and the mind is devoid of its own reflective nature. When the mind is so fully absorbed in the object of meditation that it loses all notions of itself as a self-conscious, reflective mind, one has reached the state of samādhi. In this state, the mind is no longer aware of itself as meditating on something external to itself; all distinctions between the yogī as the subjective meditator, the act of meditation, and the object of meditation have disappeared. Like a pure crystal which, when placed next to a red flower, appears to completely lose its own character by reflecting the form and color of the flower exclusively, the yogī is no longer self-aware, and is conscious only of the object of meditation, and it is in this level of intensity that samādhi differs from dhyāna. There is thus a progression of concentrative absorption on the object of meditation from dhāraa, through dhyāna, to samādhi, the state of consciousness ensuing when all thought has, in fact, been stilled. This is the final goal of Yoga.

There are four stages of saprajñāta samādhi, all of which have an ālabana, “a support”. This means that the consciousness of the purua is still flowing through the praktic citta to connect with or be supported by an object of meditational focus (albeit in progressively more subtle ways). In this state, the mind is fixed on one pratyaya, image, or undeviating vtti, that of the object of concentration, and resists all change into other states. The object of concentration, whatever it might be, is the ālabana, that is, the unwavering image the object produces on the concentrated mind.

The first level of saprajñāta samādhi, vitarka samādhi, is taken to be contemplation on a gross physical object, that is to say, meditating on an object which one experiences as a manifestation or construct of the gross physical or material atomic elements. It is thus the first level of experiencing an object in samādhi.

This first stage is further refined by Patañjali, and subdivided into two subdivisions: sa- “with” vitarka, and nir- “without” vitarka. When the yogī uses an object such as, say, a cow, as the meditational support, or object of concentration (ālabana), but the yogī’s awareness of this object is conflated with the word for and the concept of a cow, this absorption is known as savitarka samādhi (samāpatti), “absorption with physical awareness.” In other words, the yogī’s experience of the object is still subtly tinged with awareness of what the object is called, and with the memory or idea corresponding to that object. Direct experience of the object in its own right and on its own ground of being is tainted by the imposition of conceptual thought upon it.

When, in contrast, the object stands out in its own right without being conflated with the conventional terminologies of language that might refer to it, or with any idea or meaning it might generate, nirvitarka samādhi has been attained. This non-conceptual, or, perhaps more accurately, super-conceptual stage occurs when the yogī’s citta has been purged of any memory awareness of what the object is and what it is called. In other words, no saskāric imprints pertaining to “cow” are activated on any subconscious or intuitive level whatsoever. In this state there is no recognition of what the object of meditation is, or what its name or function are; recognition is colored exclusively by the object of focus itself without any discursive analysis of the object’s place in the greater scheme of things and without the normal instinctive impulsion to identify it. Moreover, the mind has also given up its own nature of being an organ of knowledge. In other words, awareness is not even aware of the mind as being an instrument channeling awareness onto an object. In a sense, all “knowledge” of the object as conventionally understood has been suspended, and the mind has completely transformed itself into the object, free from any discursive identification or self-awareness. The object can now shine forth in its own right as an object with its own inherent existence, free from labels, categorizations or situatedness in the grand scheme of things. We can note that the object has in effect become the yogi’s entire universe, since awareness is focused on it exclusively and is thus unaware of anything else, even the discursive process itself.

Keeping the metaphysics of Sāṁkhya in mind, we know that the five gross elements which constitute gross physical objects evolve from elements that are more subtle still. That is to say, they are actually evolutes from the tanmātras, the five subtle elements. The second level of samādhi concentration, vicāra samādhi, involves absorption into this more subtle aspect of the object of meditation, that is to say, perceiving the object as actually consisting of these more subtle ingredients. In fact, the subtle substructure of external reality can refer to any of the evolutes from prakti, as the tanmātras themselves evolve from ahakāra which, in turn, evolves from buddhi. Thus, the latter can also be considered sūkma, subtle. As a new archer first aims at large objects, and then progressively smaller ones, so the neophyte yogī first experiences the gross nature of the object in meditation, and then its progressively more subtle nature. Thus, instead of experiencing the object as comprised of compact quantum masses, the bhūtādi gross elements, as in the first state of vitarka, in vicāra, the yogī experiences them as vibratory, radiant potential, subtle energy, (a sublevel of reality normally imperceptible to the senses).

Vicāra samādhi, like vitarka, is also subdivided into two subdivisions of sa- “with,” and nir- “without.” When the intensity of focus on the object of meditation deepens such that the yogī penetrates its gross externalization and experiences the object as consisting of subtle elements, the tanmātras, but subtle elements circumscribed as existing in time and space, then the ensuing concentrative state of awareness is known as savicāra. In other words, in savicāra meditation, an object is perceived as consisting of subtle elements, but the object is still experienced as existing in the present time, rather than in the past or future, and is still bounded by space, that is, it is taking up some distinct physical space in the presence of the meditator rather than being situated anywhere else. Briefly put, at this stage, the yogī still has some level of awareness of space and time.

When, on the other hand, the yogī can focus on the object unconditioned by such dimensionality; in other words when he or she cannot just focus on the subtle nature of an object, but transcends space and time and perceives that these subtle essences pervade and underpin all things at all times, then the yogī has attained the state of nirvicāra. In this state, the yogī is no longer aware of dimensionality and temporality – the here and now. The object is no longer a distinct object taking up extension in a portion of space different from other spatial objects and existing in the present, rather than any other time, because the yogī experiences the subtle elements of the object as underpinning all objects at all times. In other words, the form of the object dissolves as it were under the power of the yogī’s focus, and the yogī now is simply experiencing vibrant subtle energies pervading all reality everywhere and eternally.

There is no consensus amongst the commentators as to the exact nature of the last two stages of samādhi, ānanda and asmitā, underscoring the fact that such states are experiential and do not lend themselves to scholastic categorization and analysis. The version that surfaces most commonly utilizes the three components of knowledge identified in Hindu philosophical discourse to demarcate the differences between these four stages of samādhi. In any act of knowledge, there is the “knower,” or subject of knowledge; the instruments of knowledge (mind and senses, etc.); and the object of knowledge. These are termed “ghit,” “grahaa,” and “grāhya” respectively (literally: the “grasper,” the “instrument of grasping,” and “that which is grasped”). In the first two stages of samādhi outlined above, vitarka and vicāra, the object upon which the mind is fixed, whether perceived as its grosser outer form or subtler inner constituents, is an external one and therefore considered grāhya (“that which is grasped”). Now, in the third stage, ānanda samādhi, the yogī transfers awareness from the objects of the senses, grāhya, to the organs of the senses themselves, grahaa (the instruments of grasping), or more precisely, the powers (śakti) behind the sensual abilities of seeing, touching, smelling, tasting and hearing, (rather than the gross physical organs of eye, ear, nose, etc.). The citta now becomes aware of the mechanisms of cognition, the instruments of the senses. It becomes aware of the internal organ through which external objects are “grasped,” rather than the external objects themselves, whether experienced in their gross or subtle constitutions.

Since, in Sāṁkhya, the grahaa includes the internal organ, manas, buddhi and ahakāra, the support of the mind in ānanda samādhī is the citta itself, specifically in its aspect as ahakāra. Thus, in this third stage, awareness becomes aware of the citta itself in its capacity of acquiring knowledge, as an ‘instrument’ which ‘grasps’ the objects of the senses.  In other words, the mind focuses on its own cognizing nature. Since the gua of sattva predominates in ahakāra and buddhi, and sattva is the source of bliss, Patañjali calls this stage ānanda samādhi, the “blissful absorption.”

Finally, by involuting awareness further still and penetrating the internal organ of meditation to its still more essential nature, one transcends even the instruments of knowledge and arrives at buddhi, to the closest praktic coverings, to the purua itself. Relentless in the pursuit of true and ultimate knowledge, at this point the yogī attains the fourth and final stage of saprajñāta samādhi. Having penetrated the constituents of the external object of meditation through its gross and subtle elements, consecutively in the first two stages of samādhi, and having withdrawn itself from external cognition and into a state of contemplating the powers behind the very organs of cognition in the third, awareness penetrates the citta further still, absorbing itself in the citta’s feature of buddhi, the grahit, “the grasper,” the closest praktic covering to the purua itself.

One final step now remains where this ultimate uncoupling of purua from all connection with prakti and all involvement with the citta occurs. This is asaprajñāta samādhi, samādhi without support. This all results in a total of six stages of saprajñāta samādhi, before the final stage of asaprajñāta samādhi. Therefore, including the latter, there will be a total of seven stages of samādhi explicitly expressed by Patañjali in his system.

As we have seen, the four states of saprajñāta all involved the citta in various ways. Asaprajñāta is beyond the mind. It is therefore beyond thought and word. To underscore this, perhaps, Patañjali has used the simple pronoun anya, “the other,” rather than a descriptive term, thereby pointing to asaprajñāta as a state which transcends all descriptive categories and nomenclatures. The commentators present asaprajñāta samādhi, samādhi “without support,” as being the state where the awareness of purua is no longer aware of any external entity at all, including the citta, since the latter has dissolved itself. This state corresponds with nirbīja, without seed” (I.51). In this final and ultimate state, the supreme goal of Yoga, the mind is not supported by any active thought. The vttis of the mind exist simply as potential, and the saskāras, the subconscious imprints that trigger thoughts, memories and karma, are also latent. Since the mind is now empty of all thoughts, the awareness of purua now no longer has any object whatsoever to be aware of, and thus, for the first time, can only become self-aware (loosely speaking). The final goal of Yoga has been attained.

Another way of considering this is that awareness is eternal, it cannot ever cease being aware. That being the case, the self’s only options are of what it is aware of: it can be object aware, or (again, loosely speaking) subject aware – that is, aware of entities or objects other than itself, or exclusively aware of itself as awareness with no reference to any other entity. After myriad births being aware of the unlimited varieties of prakṛtic objects, puruṣa has now come to the point of self-realization – realizing itself as distinct from not just objects of thought, but the very faculty and process of thought itself, the citta and its vṛttis. When there are no objects to detain its awareness other than its own self, the svarupa of YS I.3, this is asaṁprajñāta samādhi.

5. Epistemology

The Yoga school accepts three sources of receiving knowledge, pramāa, as valid (YS I.7), in accordance with the Sāṁkhya tradition. The first is sense perception, pratyāka, placed first on the list of pramāas because the other pramāas are dependent on it. Vyāsa defines sense perception as being the state or condition of the mind, vtti, which apprehends both the specific (viśea) and generic (sāmānya) nature of an external object discussed further below. This apprehension is accomplished by the citta encountering a sense object through the senses and forming an impression of this object, a vtti. More specifically, the tāmasic nature of sense objects imprint themselves upon the mind, and are then illuminated in the mind by the mind’s sāttvic nature. Due to pervading the mind, the purua, or self, then becomes conscious of this mental impression, as if it were taking place within itself, indistinguishable from itself. In actual fact, the impression is imprinted on the citta, mind, which is pervaded by consciousness but external to it.

The second pramāa, source of receiving valid knowledge, is anumāna, inference (logic), defined as the assumption that an object of a particular category shares the same qualities as other objects in the same category – qualities which are not shared by objects in different categories. Yoga accepts Nyāya principles here.

Finally, agama, “verbal testimony,” the third source of valid knowledge accepted by Patañjali, is the relaying of accurate information through the medium of words by a “trustworthy” person who has perceived or inferred the existence of an object, to someone who has not. “Trustworthy” is someone whose statements cannot be contradicted, has sense organs appropriately working in a suitable external environment, and is trustworthy and compassionate and free from defects such as illusion, laziness, deceit, dull-wittedness and so forth. The words of such a reliable authority enter the ear and produce an image, vtti, in the mind of the hearer that corresponds to the vtti experienced by the trustworthy person. The person receiving the information in this manner has neither personally experienced nor inferred the existence of the object of knowledge, but valid knowledge of the object is nonetheless achieved, which distinguishes this source of knowledge from the two discussed previously.

Returning to the most important episteme, perception, one must note that there are different types of pratyaka: the commentary on the khya Kārikā, the Yuktidīpikā, speaks of yogic perception as well as sensual perception (38.2). Indeed, several schools make a distinction between aparapratyaka, conventional perception, and parapratyaka, supernormal perception, or, as the khya Sūtras put it, external perception, bahya-pratyaka, and internal perception abahya pratyaka (I.90). The perception of interest to Yoga is the latter, that of a supernormal nature. But even the startling claims of omniscience that one encounters in the text are relevant only as signposts of experiences that the yogī will encounter on the path of Yoga, not as articles of faith.

Returning to the term viśea, particularity” or specificity,” the term is best understood in contrast to “sāmānya,” which refers to the general category of an object. Let us consider a “cow,” or the standard item used to exemplify a generic object in philosophical commentarial discourse, a “pot.”  The word “cow” refers to a generic category of bovine creature with udders and horns, who give milk and go “moo”; and “pot” to a roundish container usually made of clay (in India) that holds liquids or other substances. Although there are millions of cows in the world, and each and every one is distinct, individual and unique in some way, the term “cow” does not particularize or distinguish one cow from another. It is a general term that refers to an entire category of creatures. Likewise with the term “pot.” The term sāmānya, then refers to the genus, species or general category of something; terms like “cow” and “pot,” indeed all words in human speech, refer to objects only in terms of their generic characteristics. Viśea, by contrast is what particularizes ultimate entities from each other, and ultimately one atom from another (the delimiting feature an atom has that makes it a unique specific individual, distinct from any other atom).

According to Yoga, these three forms of knowledge as conventionally accepted are all limited because they cannot provide information about “particulars” or specifics. Verbal testimony is dependent on words, and words, like “cow,” can only point to the cow as a member of a general class of things - so when we say something like “there is a cow in the field,” we are only really giving information about the cow as a member of a species, and not about particulars: we are not conveying precise information about the specifics of the particular individual cow in question.

Along exactly the same lines, inference, also, only deals with generalities (and is, in fact, dependent on perception in the first place).  As for empirical sense perception, it is true, say the commentators, that when we look at a particular cow or pot, we might be able to pick up on some characteristic that distinguishes the particular cow or pot in front of us from other cows and pots – perhaps this cow has odd skin color or the pot an odd shape. But conventional sense perception, says Vyāsa, cannot provide us information about the precisely specific or subtle nature of an object – its atomic composition for example, nor about distant or hidden objects beyond the range of the senses.

Only through the clear, unobstructed insight of samādhi can one fully grasp the viśea, particularity, of an object, its subtle substructure of distinct atoms and subtle essences. Patañjali claims that the yogī can tell the difference between two identical items, since, although they appear identical to normal perception, the atoms comprising them are different, and it is these that the yogī can perceive. We must keep in mind that the yogic tradition claims one can actually perceive these essences through the undeviatingly concentrated focus of mind in the higher stages of samādhi, not merely theorize their existence. This perception, then, is actually a form of pratyaka, but not that of conventional sense perception. As noted earlier, the Yuktidīpikā commentary on Sāṁkhya points out that yogic pratyaka transcends normal sense-based perception. It is parapratyaka, “higher,” supreme, supernormal, perception.

Additionally, since the citta is by nature luminous, once the influences of rajas and tamas have been removed, there is nothing to obstruct its natural luminosity, and it can pass beyond the limitations inherent in finite objects due to the tamas preponderant in physical things. The ingredients of the mind itself are the same as those underpinning the object in external reality, the three guṇas; we must keep in mind here that the gross and subtle elements are nothing other than tamas-dominant evolutes from sattva-dominant buddhi and ahaṁkāra. Thus when fully sāttvic, the mind can transcend its own kleśa limitations (II.2ff) and merge into the common substratum of all things. This corresponds to such states as savicāra described in the section on samādhi, when the yogī’s awareness perceives that the subtle nature of the object of meditation as well as the meditating mind itself actually pervades all objects and thus all reality. So, once the obstructing qualities of rajas and tamas have been removed, then the pure luminosity of consciousness passes beyond the limitations of all boundaries and finite objects. In other words, the commentators claim that in the higher stages of samādhi, the yogī becomes essentially omniscient since awareness is no longer limited to the body or dimensionality but can radiate out infinitely and permeate the subtle substratum in the form of buddhi, ahaṁkāra, the tanmātra, etc. (as well as the specific conglomeration of atoms that emerge from these tanmātras), underpinning all objects. It can thus perceive the viśeṣa, particularity, that is, the specific atomic composition, of any particular object. As an aside, this ability reflects the metaphysics of the supernormal mystic powers inherent in the Yoga tradition, a discussion of which occupies almost a quarter of the text (but which are beyond the scope of this entry).

6. Ethics

Patañjali outlines a practice essential for enhancing sattva and lucidity, the prerequisite for attaining steadiness in the mind. We have established by now that the path and attainments of Yoga are nothing other than the maximization of the gua of sattva. Central to the Yoga tradition, then, are the ethical and other practices indispensable to this objective. Verse I.33 states that as a result of cultivating an attitude of “friendship” with those who find themselves in a “situation of happiness,” one of “compassion” towards those in “distress,” one of “joy” towards “pious” selves, and one of “equanimity” or indifference towards the “impious,” sattva is generated. Consequently, the mind becomes lucid – clarity being the nature of sattva. Once clear, one-pointed concentration, or steadiness, which is the goal of meditational Yoga, can be achieved by the mind.

From an ethical point of view, by being a well-wisher towards those who are happy, as well as those who are virtuous, the contamination of envy is removed. By compassion towards those miserable, that is, by wishing to remove someone’s miseries as if they were one’s own, the contamination of the desire to inflict harm on others is removed. By equanimity towards the impious, the contamination of intolerance is removed. By thus removing these traits of envy, desire to inflict harm, and intolerance, which are characteristics of rajas and tamas, the sattva natural to the mind can manifest. In the ensuing state of lucidity, the inclination towards seeking higher truths by controlling the vttis, in other words towards cultivating a focused state of mind by the practice of yoga, spontaneously arises, because the inclination for enlightenment is natural to the pure sāttvic mind.

A further set of ethical practices indispensable for increasing the sattva component of the mind are the five yamas, observances (literally “restraints”) of chapter II: non-violence, truthfulness; refrainment from stealing; celibacy and renunciation of [unnecessary] possessions. From these, ahi, non-violence, is the yama singled out by the commentators for special attention, and therefore leads the list and thus, the entire eight limbs of Yoga (it seems important to note that the yamas themselves lead the list of the eight limbs suggesting that one’s yogic accomplishment remains limited until the yamas are internalized and put into practice) (YS II.30).

Vyāsa accordingly takes ahi as the root of the other yamas. He defines it as not injuring any living creature anywhere at any time. Just as the footprints of an elephant covers the footprints of all other creatures, so does ahi cover all the other yamas - one continues to undertake more and more vows and austerities for the sole purpose of purifying ahi.

Vyāsa defines “truth,” the second yama, as one’s words and thoughts being in exact correspondence to fact, that is, to whatever is known through the three processes of knowledge accepted by the Yoga school. Speech is for the transfer of one’s knowledge to others, and should not be deceitful, misleading or devoid of value. It should be for the benefit of all creatures, and not for their harm. However, underscoring the centrality of ahi – truth must never result in violence. In other words, if there is ever a conflict between the yamas – if observing one yama results in the compromise of another – then ahi must always be respected first.

“Refrainment from stealing,” the third yama, is described as not taking things belonging to others, and not even harboring the desire to do so.  Vyāsa defines “celibacy” as the control of the sexual organs, and this is further refined by Vācaspati Miśra as not seeing, speaking with, embracing, or otherwise interacting with members of the opposite sex as objects of desire. In short, self-realization cannot be attained if one is sexually absorbed because this indicates that one is still seeking fulfillment on the sensual level, and thus misidentifying with the non-self.

Vyāsa defines “renunciation of possessions” as the ability to see the problems caused by the acquisition, preservation and destruction of things, since these only provoke attachment and injury. These yamas are considered the great vow; they are not exempted by one’s class, place, time or circumstance. They are universal in all aspects of life’s affairs and social interactions. Without them rajas and tamas cannot be curtailed, and the sattva essential to the higher stages of Yoga is unattainable.

7. Theism

Patañjali in YS I.23 states that the goal of Yoga can be attained by the grace of God, śvara-prāidhānād vā. The theistic, or śvaravāda element in Indic thought stretches back at least to the late Vedic period. Of the six “schools” of traditional thought that stem from this period, five – Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Vedānta, Yoga and Sāṁkhya – were, or became, theistic. Sāṁkhya, although often represented as nontheistic, was, in point of fact, widely theistic in its early expressions, and continued to retain widespread theistic variants outside of the later classical philosophical school associated with Ῑśvarakṛṣṇa, as evidenced in the Purāṇas and Bhagavad Gītā. Reflecting Patañjali’s undogmatic and nonsectarian sophistication, although śvara-praidhāna, “devotion to God” may not be the exclusive or mandatory way to attain realization of the self (given the particle vā “or” in I.23) it is clearly favored by him. The term “śvara” occurs in three distinct contexts in the Yoga Sūtras. The first, beginning with I.23, is in the context of how to attain the ultimate goal of Yoga, namely, the cessation of all thought, saprajñāta samādhi and realization of purua. Patañjali presents dedication to śvara as one such option. But it is important to note the word va, “or,” in this sūtra, indicating that Patañjali presents devotion to śvara, the Lord, as an optional means of attaining samādhi, rather than an obligatory one.

In the ensuing discussion, Patañjali states that:

the Lord is a special self because he is untouched by the deposits of saskāras, karma and its fructification, and the obstacles to the practice of yoga, the kleśas of nescience, ego, attachment, aversion and the will-to-live. He is omniscient, and also the teacher of the ancients, because he is not limited by Time.

Given the primary context of the Sūtras, namely fixing the mind on an object, two sūtras, I.27–28, specify how śvara is to be meditated upon: “his designation is the mystical syllable “om,” and its repetition, japa, and the contemplation of its meaning should be performed.” This points to the ubiquitous and most prominent form of Hindu meditation from the classical period to the present day: mantra recitation (japa). As a result of this devotional type of meditation, “comes the realization of the inner consciousness and freedom from all obstacles.”

The second context in which Patañjali refers to śvara is in the first sūtra in chapter II, where kriyā yoga, the path of action, is described as consisting of austerity, study and devotion to the Lord. By performing such kriyā yoga, samādhi is attained and the obstacles (the kleśas of II.3), are weakened. Finally, śvara surfaces again in a third context in the second chapter, II.32, where the niyamas are listed. The niyamas, which are the second limb of the eight-limbed path of Yoga, consist of cleanliness, contentment, austerity, study and, as in the other two contexts, śvarapraidhāna, devotion to śvara (thus, the three ingredients of kriyā yoga are all niyamas). The various benefits associated with following the yamas and niyamas, ethics and morals, are noted in the ensuing sūtras of the chapter, and II.45 states that the benefit from the niyama of devotion to God is the attainment of samādhi. This is the final reference to śvara in the text, but it is significant, because all the boons mentioned as accruing from the other yamas and niyamas (there are ten in all) represent praktic, or material, attainments – vitality, knowledge of past lives, detachment, etc., etc.  It is only from śvarapraidhāna, the last item on the list of yamas and niyamas, that the ultimate goal of Yoga, samādhi, is achieved. These then are the gleanings that can be extracted from Patañjali's characteristically frugal sūtras.

From these we can conclude that Patañjali is definitely promoting a degree of theistic practice in the Yoga Sūtras. Although in the first context, śvarapraidhāna, devotional surrender to God, is optional as a means of attaining samādhi, Patañjali does direct six sūtras to śvara, which is not insignificant given the frugality of his sūtras. This devotional surrender is not optional in the second context, kriyā yoga. Since it is likewise not optional in the third context as a niyama, which is a prerequisite to meditational yoga, Patañjali seems to be requiring that all aspiring yogīs be devotionally oriented in the preparatory stages to the higher goals of Yoga and, while in the higher, more meditational stages of practice they may shift their meditational focus of concentration to other objects – even, ultimately, to any object of their pleasing (I.39) – they would best be advised to retain śvara as object thereafter, since this “special purua” can bestow perfection of samādhi which other objects cannot (II.45).

Patañjali also states that śvara is represented by the mystical syllable “om.” Om has been understood as a sonal incarnation of Brahman (which is the most common term used for the Absolute Truth in the Upaniads), since the late Vedic period. A scholastic such as Patañjali would most certainly have been well schooled in the Upaniṣads (especially given his own mandate of the prerequisite of study for success in yoga, II.1 & 44), which, as an orthodox thinker, he would have accepted as śruti, divine revelation. Even though he never refers to Brahman in the Sūtras, here again we must wonder whether along with all the śvara theologies of his time he is quite consciously equating the Upaniṣadic Brahman with this personal śvara, by means of this common denominator of om.

It is through the sound om that the yogi is to fix the mind on Ῑśvara. After all, since Ῑśvara, as a type of puruṣa, is beyond prakṛti, and therefore beyond conceptualization or any type of vṛtti, how is one to fix one’s mind upon him - the prakṛtic mind cannot perceive that which is finer than itself? Patañjali here provides the means: through the recitation of the syllable in which Ῑśvara manifests. Such recitation is called japa (an old Vedic term common in the old Brāhmaṇa texts, where it referred to the soft recitation of Vedic mantras by the priest.) By constantly repeating om and contemplating its meaning, artha, namely Ῑśvara, the mind of the yogī becomes one-pointed – the goal of all yoga practice. Repeating the sound om and “contemplating its meaning,” namely, that it is the sound representation of Ῑśvara, the object of the yogī’s surrender, when coupled with Patañjali’s usage of the word praṇidhāna, surrender, in I.23, points to chanting the mantra in a devotional mood. This is quintessential Hindu theistic meditation, the most prominent form of Hindu Yoga evidenced from antiquity to the present day.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Aranya, Swami Hariharananda. 1984. Yoga Philosophy of Patanjali [with the commentary of Vyasa]. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Ballantyne, James Robert. 1852. The Aphorisms of the Yoga Philosophy of Patañjali with Illustrative Extracts from the Commentary By Bhoja Raja. Allahabad: Presbyterian Mission Press.
  • Hariharānanda, Mukerji. 1963. Yoga Philosophy of Patañjali. Calcutta: Calcutta University (reprint, New York: SUNY, 1977).
  • Kumar Shiv & Bhargava, D.N. 1980. Yultidipika. Delhi: Eastern Book Linkers.
  • Manikar, T.G.1972. Samkhya Karika of Isvarakrsna with Gaudabhasya. Poona: Oriental Book Agency.
  • Rukmani, T.S.1981. Yogavārttika of Vijñānabhikßu. 4 vols. Delhi: Munshiram Manoharlal.
  • Sharma, Har Dutt. 1933. The Samkhya Karika [with the commentary of Gaudapada]. Poona: Oriental Book Agency.
  • Sharma, Har Dutt. 1934 The Tattva Kaumudi. Poona: Oriental Book Agency.
  • Woods, James Haughton. 1912. The Yoga System of Patañjali [with the commentary of Vacaspati]. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, (reprint, 1998).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Alter, Joseph. 2004. Yoga in Modern India: The Body between Science and Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Bhattacharya, Ram Shankar. 1985. An Introduction to the Yoga Sütra. Delhi: Bharatiya Vidya Prakasansa.
  • Bronkhurst, Johannes. 1993. The Two Traditions of Meditation in Ancient India. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Brockington, John, “Epic Yoga” Journal of Vaishnava Studies 14.1. Fall (2005): 123-138.
  • Bryant, Edwin. 2009. The Yoga Sutras: A New Edition, Translation, and Commentary. New York: North Point Press.
  • Chapple, Christopher. 2003. Reconciling Yogas. Albany: State University of New York.
  • Dasgupta, S. 1922. A History of Indian Philosophy Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Dasgupta, S. Hindu Mysticism. 1927. Chicago: The Open Court Publishing Company.
  • De Michelis, Elizabeth. 2004. History of Modern Yoga: Patanjali and Western Esotericism. New York and London: Continuum.
  • Eliade, Mircea. 1958. Yoga: Immortality and Freedom. Translated by Willard R. Trask. London: Kegan Paul.
  • Feuerstein, Georg. 1989. The Yoga-Sutra of Patañjali: A New Translation and Commentary. Rochester, VT: Inner Traditions.
  • Feuerstein, Georg. 1996. The Philosophy of Classical Yoga. Rochester, VT: Inner Traditions.
  • Feuerstein, Georg. 2001. The Yoga Tradition: Its History, Literature, Philosophy, and Practice. Prescott, AZ: Hohm Press.
  • Feuerstein, Georg. 2003. The Deeper Dimension of Yoga: Theory and Practice. Boston: Shambhala.
  • Hopkins, E.W. 1901 “Yoga Technique in the Great Epic” Journal of the American Oriental Society. Vol 22: 333-379.
  • Larson, Gerald James Classical Sākhya. 1979. Delhi: Motilal Benarsidass.
  • Larson, Gerald James. 1999. “Classical Yoga as Neo- Sāṁkhya: a Chapter in the History of Indian Philosophy” Asiatische Studien Études Asiatiques. LII.3: 723-732.
  • Larson, Gerald James and Bhattacharya. 2008. Yoga: India’s philosophy of Meditation. Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies. Volume XII. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Singleton, Mark. 2010. Yoga Body: The Origins of Modern Posture Practice. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Yamashita Koichi. 1994. Pātañjala Yoga Philosophy with Reference to Buddhism. Calcutta: Firma KLM.
  • Whicher, Ian. 1998. The Integrity of the Yoga Darśana. New York: SUNY.


Author Information

Edwin Bryant
Rutgers University
U. S. A.

Ludwig Wittgenstein: Later Philosophy of Mathematics

Mathematics was a central and constant preoccupation for Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889–1951). He started in philosophy by reflecting on the nature of mathematics and logic; and, at the end of his life, his manuscripts on these topics amounted to thousands of pages, including notebooks and correspondence. In 1944, he said his primary contribution to philosophy was in the philosophy of mathematics. Yet his later views on mathematics have been less well received than his earlier conception, due to their anti-scientific, even anti-rationalist, spirit.

This article focuses on the relation between the later Wittgenstein’s philosophy of mathematics and other philosophies of mathematics, especially Platonism; however, other doctrines (formalism, conventionalism, constructivism, empiricism) will be discussed as well.

Wittgenstein does not sympathize with any traditional philosophy of mathematics, and in particular his hostility toward Platonism (the conception that mathematics is about a-causal objects and mind-independent truths) is quite evident. This is in line with what can be described as his more general philosophical project: to expose deep conceptual confusions in the academic doctrines, rather than to defend his own doctrine. In fact, it is not even clear that the threads of his thinking on mathematics, when pulled together, amount to what we would today call a coherent, unified -ism. However, one view that can be attributed to him is that mathematical identities such as ‘Three times three is nine’ are not really propositions, as their superficial form indicates, but are certain kinds of rules; and, thus understood, the question is whether they are arbitrary or not. The interpretive position preferred in this article is that they are not, since they are grounded in empirical regularities – hence the recurrence of the theme of the applicability of mathematics in Wittgenstein’s later reflections on this topic.

Some have characterized him as a finitist-constructivist, others as a conventionalist, while many strongly disagree about these labels. He notoriously held the view that philosophy should be eminently descriptive, strongly opposing any interference with how mathematics is actually done (though he also predicted that lucid philosophy would curb the growth of certain mathematical branches). In particular, he was worried about the philosophers’ tendency to provide a foundation for mathematics, mainly because he thought it does not need one.

Table of Contents

  1. The Reaction from Other Philosophers
  2. Which 'ism'?
  3. Mathematical Reality
  4. Philosophical Method, Finitism-Constructivism, Logicism and Formalism
  5. Regularities, Rules, Agreement, and Contingency
  6. Concluding Remarks
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Wittgenstein's Writings
    2. Other Sources

1. The Reaction from Other Philosophers


Although Wittgenstein’s earlier views on mathematics and logic (mainly exposed in his 1922 work Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus) have been very influential, his later conception (roughly, post-1929) has been “met with an ambivalent reaction, (...) drawing both the interest and the ire of working logicians” (Floyd [2005, 77]). A good deal of Wittgenstein’s later work on mathematics has been collected and edited by G.H. von Wright, R. Rhees and G.E.M. Anscombe under the title Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics (RFM hereafter), and was first published in 1956. Another collection, Wittgenstein's Lectures on the Foundations of Mathematics. Cambridge 1939, was edited by Cora Diamond and published in 1976. Two harsh reviews of RFM, by G. Kreisel [1958] and A. R. Anderson [1958], set the tone for a sceptical attitude toward his later views on mathematics persisting even into the late twentieth century. P. Maddy, for instance, places the following warning at the beginning of her lucid Wittgenstein section in Naturalism in Mathematics: “Some philosophers, especially those with a technical bent, tend to be unsympathetic to the style and content of the late Wittgenstein. I encourage such Wittgenstein-phobes to skip over [the section].” [1997, 161, fn. 1] Perhaps illustrative for this way of thinking is also the omission of the Wittgenstein material in the second edition [1983] of Benacerraf and Putnam’s landmark collection Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Readings. (The first edition of 1964 included excerpts from RFM.)

This Wittgenstein-phobia, if it truly exists, is surely regrettable – not only because of the intrinsic value of Wittgenstein’s highly original insights, but also because understanding his views on mathematics might illuminate difficult themes in his widely-studied work Philosophical Investigations [1953] (PI). It is telling that the early draft of PI had contained a good portion of what is now RFM, and it is no coincidence that some of the examples and scenarios used to illustrate the much discussed rule-following ‘paradoxes’ appearing in PI are cast in mathematical terms (Fogelin [1976], Kripke [1982]).

2. Which 'ism'?

This article focuses on the relation between later Wittgenstein’s philosophy of mathematics and other philosophies of mathematics, especially Platonism; however, other doctrines (formalism, conventionalism, constructivism, empiricism) will be discussed as well. Hopefully, even a glance at this relation will give the reader a minimally misleading sense of his later views on mathematics – although, naturally, there is much more to explore than can be covered here (for example, Wittgenstein’s points on proofs as forging ‘internal relations’ and their role in concept formation, his take on mathematical necessity, or on Gödel’s First Incompleteness Theorem, this last issue alone generating a series of interesting exchanges over the years; see Tymoczko [1984), Shanker [1988), Rodych [1999, 2006], Putnam and Floyd [2000], Floyd [2001], Steiner [2001], Bays [2004]). Note also that very little will be said on the debate over the partition of Wittgenstein’s thinking. When it comes to mathematics, the standard demarcation (two Wittgensteins – the ‘early’ one of the Tractatus, and the ‘later’ one of the PI and RFM) is questioned by Gerrard ([1991], [1996]), who distinguishes two lines of thought within the post-Tractarian period: a middle one, or “the calculus conception”, to be found in Philosophical Grammar (PG), and a truly later one, “the language-game conception." Stern [1991], however, worries about too finely dividing Wittgenstein’s thinking, concerned with the more recent tendency to add even the fourth period, post-PI, which Wittgenstein devoted to philosophical psychology and is illustrated in his Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology.

In addition to the aphoristic and multi-voiced style, one of the most baffling aspects of later Wittgenstein’s views on mathematics is his position relative to the traditional philosophies of mathematics. While his hostility toward Platonism (especially in the version advocated by the Cambridge mathematician G. E. Hardy) is quite pronounced, not much can be confidently said about the doctrine he actually espouses. In fact, given his rejection of theories and theses in philosophy (PI §128), one might even suspect that the threads of his thought, when pulled together, do not amount to what we would today call a ‘position’, let alone a coherent, unified ‘ism.’ He rejects the logicism of his former teachers Frege and Russell, but this does not turn him into a formalist (of Hilbertian inspiration), or an intuitionist-constructivist-finitist (like Brouwer); moreover, Kantian sympathies are discernible, even empiricist ones. Most of Wittgenstein’s remarks, however, are directed against academic schools, and Fogelin [1987], for one, describes his position via a double negative: ‘anti-platonism without conventionalism.’  Here I will not propose a new label, yet the best starting point to discuss Wittgenstein’s conception is its relation to conventionalism. How exactly his views relate to this doctrine is, once again, hard to pin down; what appears relatively clearer is that his conventionalism is not the ‘full-blooded’ conventionalism that Dummett [1959] attributed to him.

As a first approximation, for Wittgenstein arithmetical identities (such as ‘three times three is nine’) are not propositions, as their superficial grammar indicates – but rules. Importantly though, these rules are not arbitrary; in a sense (to be explicated later on), the rules in place are the only ones that could have been adopted or, as Steiner [2009, 12] put it, “the only rules available." The typical conventionalist difficulty (that they might have an arbitrary character) is answered when it is added that the rules are grounded in objectively verifiable empirical regularities (Fogelin [1987]; Steiner [1996], [2000], [2009]); or, as Wittgenstein says, the empirical regularities are “hardened” into rules (RFM VI-22). In discussing Wittgenstein’s relation to conventionalism, a central task in what follows will be to clarify why (and how, and what kind of) agreement within a community is a crucial presupposition of the very existence of mathematics.

3. Mathematical Reality

As stated above, it is an open question whether Wittgenstein actually held a ‘position’ in the philosophy of mathematics, in the sense of advancing a compact body of doctrine. Most of his remarks seem reactions to what he takes to be (philosophical, non-trivial) misunderstandings concerning the nature of mathematics. Platonism falls in this category. He most likely understood this doctrine as the conjunction of two tenets: a semantic thesis – mathematical propositions state truths, and an ontological claim, according to which the truth-makers of the mathematical propositions, that is, objects like numbers, sets, functions, and so forth, exist, in a fashion similar to Plato’s forms, and populate an a-causal, non-spatiotemporal domain. This is to say that they are abstract; additionally, they are also language- and mind-independent. A third, epistemological, thesis is often added: we humans can know about these objects and truths insofar as we possess a special cognitive faculty of ‘intuition’ (that is, despite the fact that we don’t interact with them causally). However, note that an adequate characterization of Platonism itself, or of the version Wittgenstein dismissed, are substantial philosophical tasks in themselves, and this article will not attempt to undertake them. Yet one issue, among others, is worth mentioning in passing. There are Platonist realists who claim that mathematical statements have truth-value (Shapiro [2000] calls this “realism in truth-value”), yet also hold that this does not entail that certain ‘objects’ need to be postulated as their truth-makers (the view that we do need to postulate these objects is called “realism in ontology”). Many famous mathematicians, philosophers and logicians have been attracted or intrigued by Platonism: Hardy [1929], [1967], Bernays [1935], Gödel [1947], Benaceraff [1973], Dummett [1978a] are loci classici. More recently, Burgess and Rosen [1997] and Balaguer [1998] offer book-length treatments of this conception; Linebo [2009] and Cole [2010] are useful surveys and rich up-to-date bibliographical sources.

What is Wittgenstein’s take on Platonism? The standard view is that for him this conception is what C. Wright [1980, 5] calls a “dangerous error.” Wittgenstein surely believed that it is extremely misleading to understand mathematical identities as stating truths about some (mathematical) objects. This is so because mathematical formulae are not in the business of making statements to begin with: they are not propositions. The acceptance of this assumption – that they are, as their surface grammar indicates – is, for some commentators, one of those “decisive moment[s] in the conjuring trick (...)” he mentions in PI §308, “the very one that we thought quite innocent." Thus, the decisive step on the road leading to Platonism is asking the question ‘What is mathematics about?’ The query seems innocent indeed: mathematics is a type of discourse, all discourses have a subject-matter, so mathematics must have one too. To see the problem with this question, Wittgenstein urges us to consider another question – ‘What is chess about?’ (This kind of move is characteristic for his style of philosophizing in the later period.) The initial question suggests a certain perspective on the issue, while the new question is meant to challenge this perspective, to reveal other possibilities – in particular, that mathematical equations may not be descriptions (statements, affirmations, declaratives, and so forth), let alone descriptions of some abstract, mind-independent, non-spatiotemporal entities and their relations. As has been noted (Wrigley [1977]), this idea bears clear similarities to one of the key-thoughts of the Tractatus, that not all words (in particular the logical vocabulary) stand for things. The grammatical form of number words (as nouns), and of mathematical formulae (as affirmations), must be treated with care. More concretely, ‘is’ in ‘two and two is four’ does not have the role of a description of a state of affairs (so to speak) holding within an abstract non-spatiotemporal realm.

It is generally accepted, at least among philosophers, that Platonism is the natural, or “default” metaphysical position for the working mathematician (Cole [2010]). Wittgenstein has an interesting answer to the question ‘Why are mathematicians attracted to this view?’ and this section shall close by sketching it.

Commentators have emphasized that his answer is grounded in the distinction between applied and pure (better: not-yet-applied) mathematics, and is thus entirely different from the standard reasons adduced by Platonists themselves. (For them, this doctrine is appealing because: (i) it squares well with our pre-theoretical picture of mathematics (as containing truth-valuable, objective, mind-independent, a priori statements), and (ii) it explains the agreement among mathematicians of all times.) As Maddy [1997, 167-8] points out, Wittgenstein thought it was very important to reflect on how professional mathematicians typically account for the importance of a certain piece of mathematical formalism – say, a new theorem. (He discusses this in terms of subjecting the “interest of calculations” to a test; (RFM II-62)) One thing mathematicians could do is reveal the implications of that bit of mathematics for science and mathematics as a whole. In other words, they could point out the great and unquestionable effectiveness of that formalism in other areas of mathematics and in scientific applications. Yet, when this type of answer is not available – that is, when they have to justify their interest in an unapplied formalism – they usually say things that Wittgenstein calls ‘prose’ (Wittgenstein and the Vienna Circle [WVC], p. 149). Instead of (perhaps boringly) detailing the internal-mathematical complex network of conceptual relations in which the new theorem fits, its unifying power, its capacity to open up new lines of research, and so forth, many mathematicians indulge in the more thrilling project of presenting their activity as one of foray into a mysterious super-empirical realm. Hence the familiar Platonist distinction: the claim that they do not invent theories, but discover objective eternal truths about a-causal, non-spatiotemporal objects. Wittgenstein refers to this as the illusory revelation of “the mysteries of the mathematical world” (RFM II - 40, 41).

These critical points do not amount to a positive view yet. They rather lead to more queries, two of which will be discussed in the next section.  They are: (i) What is wrong with asking what mathematics is about, and (ii) Does the comparison with chess mean that Wittgenstein believes that mathematics is (merely) a game? Note that for Wittgenstein reflection on games occupies a central place in his philosophical methodology, and that chess is his favourite object of comparison (it appears in many contexts; to mention only the PI, see §31, §33, §136, and so forth)

4. Philosophical Method, Finitism-Constructivism, Logicism and Formalism

If one asks ‘what is mathematics about?’, a typical answer is – ‘certain entities, like number 2, inhabiting a Platonic reality.' The adoption of this metaphysics comes in handy, seemingly increasing our understanding in this matter: we might get the feeling that we now finally know what mathematicians have been talking about for thousands of years. However, this is deceptive; the acceptance of this proposal creates more and deeper problems than the ones we began with. Wittgenstein regards the talk about ‘reality’ in mathematics not as a step toward a better understanding of this human practice, but as a source of confusion, of philosophical problems, which he regards as conceptual ‘illnesses’ requiring ‘treatment.' Here we encounter his view that philosophy ultimately has a therapeutic role, an idea appearing in PI first at §133, with mathematics mentioned explicitly in §254. The therapy consists in applying one of his philosophical methods – to remind  those who are puzzled of where concepts are ‘at home’, and to reveal how philosophizing uproots them from their natural context:

Consider Professor Hardy’s article (“Mathematical Proof”) and his remark that “to mathematical propositions there corresponds – in some sense, however sophisticated – a reality."..[Y]ou forget where the expression ‘a reality corresponds to’ is really at home –What is “reality”? We think of “reality” as something we can point to. It is this, that. Professor Hardy is comparing mathematical propositions to the propositions of physics. This comparison is extremely misleading (Lectures on the Foundations of Mathematics, p. 239-40; LFM hereafter)

The diagnosis of PI §38 is that philosophical problems appear when ‘language goes on holiday’, or ‘idles.' What does this mean? (The original reads "...wenn die Sprache feiert." Stern [2004, 97] argues that Rhees’ initial translation of ‘feiert’ by ‘idle’ coveys better the idea that the language does no work than Anscombe’s standard translation ‘goes on holiday.') Steps toward the clarification of this point can be made by observing that Wittgenstein has in mind here the situation in which a concept otherwise fully intelligible, oftentimes even unremarkable, is detached from its original contexts and uses (language-games). Once dragged into a new ‘territory’, the concept idles (just like a cogwheel separated from the gear), as it cannot engage other related concepts anymore. Anyone trying to employ the concept in this new ‘environment’ experiences mental cramps and disquietudes, precisely because, as it happens when one ventures into uncharted ‘terrain’, the familiar ‘paths’ and ‘crossroads’ no longer exist: one does not know her “way about” (PI §123), one does not see things clearly anymore. Hence, according to Wittgenstein, the whole point of philosophizing is not to defend ‘philosophical positions’ but to undo this perplexity, and achieve a liberating ‘perspicuous representation’, or over-view (übersichtliche Darstellung; PI §122).

When discussing the LFM quote above, Maddy observes [1997, 167] that one such problem, of much fame in the current debates in the philosophy of mathematics, is the epistemological problem for Platonists, due to Benacerraf [1973]. Roughly put, the question is how we get to know anything about numbers, if they are a-causal, non-spatiotemporal entities, and if all our knowledge arises by causal interaction with the known objects? This seems a legitimate worry, but Wittgenstein would disagree with one of its assumptions. Not only does he reject the idea that a causal basis is essential for knowledge (‘knowledge’ most likely counts as a “family-resemblance” concept, lacking an essential feature; cf. PI §67), but he tackles the issue from an entirely different angle. He notes that the force of the problem (“the feeling of something queer, “thumb-catching of the intellect”) “comes from a misunderstanding” (RFM V-6). The misunderstanding originates in what can be called a ‘transfer’ move: the Platonist assumes that the talk of ‘reality’ (and ‘entities’, and so forth) can be extended, or transferred, from the natural ‘home’ of these notions (the vernacular and the natural sciences) to the mathematical discourse – and, moreover, that this transfer can take place without loss of meaning. The rejected assumption is not that we can talk about relations and objective truth in mathematics, but that we can talk about them in the same way we talk in empirical science. Once this transfer is made, ‘deep’ questions (like Benacerraf’s) follow immediately. What Wittgenstein urges, then, is to take this epistemological difficulty as exposing the meaning-annihilation effect of the illicit transfer move – so, in the end, Platonism is not even wrong, but (disguised) nonsense.

What is the more general outcome of adopting such a philosophical strategy? A ‘therapeutic’ one: the liberation of our minds from the grip of an ‘illegitimate question’ (‘what is mathematics about?’) Such a strategy can be traced back to Heinrich Hertz’s insight in Principles of Mechanics, one of Wittgenstein’s formative readings: “(...) the question [...] will not have been answered; but our minds, no longer vexed, will cease to ask illegitimate questions.” (Hertz [1899 / 2003, 8] The question Hertz entertained was about ‘the ultimate nature of force’).

Before taking up the second issue, it is worth noting that Wittgenstein’s view fails to fit other traditional ‘isms’ too. Wrigley [1977, 50] sketches some of the reasons why he cannot be described as a finitist-constructivist, thus disagreeing with how Dummett [1959] and Bernays [1959] portray him. While following the teachings of this philosophical doctrine would lead to massive changes in mathematics (for example, a big portion of real analysis must be wiped out as meaningless), Wittgenstein notoriously held the view that “philosophy may in no way interfere with the actual use of language; it can in the end only describe it. For it cannot give it a foundation either. It leaves everything as it is. It leaves mathematics as it is, and no mathematical discovery can advance it” (PI §124). Another marked difference between Wittgenstein and the intuitionists is discussed by Gerrard [1996, 196, fn 37]. Brouwer sees mathematics as divorced from the language in which it is done, and says: “FIRST ACT OF INTUITIONISM Completely separating mathematics from mathematical language…recognizing that intuitionistic mathematics is an essentially languageless activity of the mind…” (cited in D. van Dalen [1981, 4]). Yet, as we will see below, it is a constant of Wittgenstein’s view that mathematics cannot be separated from a language and a human practice.

Moreover, Wittgenstein also distances himself from the logicism of Frege and Russell. The previous point about the status of mathematical formulae (that is, not being propositions) explains why. Insofar as mathematical formulae aren’t propositional truths, it is simply out of the question whether they are, or can be reduced to, a particular kind of truths, namely truths of logic. But Wittgenstein’s dissatisfaction with logicism goes further than that; he is unhappy with the ‘epistemically reductive’ character of this doctrine, and emphasizes the “motley” of mathematical techniques of proof (RFM III-46A, III-48). Formulated in the logicist style, mathematical proofs might gain in precision but surely lose in perspicuity and conceptual elegance. Floyd [2005, 109] summarizes the point: “That is not to say that there are no uses for formalized proofs (for example, in running computer programs). It is to say that a central part of the challenge of presenting proofs in mathematics involves synoptic designs and models, the kind of manner of organizing concepts and phenomena that is evinced in elementary arguments by diagram. This Wittgenstein treated as undercutting the force of logicism as an epistemically reductive philosophy of mathematics: the fact that the derivation of even an elementary arithmetical equation (like 7 + 5 = 12) would be unclearly expressed and unwieldy in (Russel's and Alfred North Whitehead's) Principia Mathematica shows that arithmetic has not been reduced in its essence to the system of Principia (compare RFM III-25, 45, 46).”

Returning to the second issue (how mathematics is different from a game), recall that this concern arises naturally given Wittgenstein’s insistence that mathematical formulae aren’t genuine propositions, but some kind of rules. This takes us to the question as to how Wittgenstein’s conception differs from formalism. The answer must begin by noting that mathematics provides us with “rules for the identity of descriptions” (Fogelin [1987, 214]).

Consider the multiplication 3 × 3 = 9. Obviously enough, one typical role of this equality is to license the replacement of one string of symbols (‘3’, ‘×’, ‘3’) with another symbol (‘9’) in extensional contexts. Wittgenstein does not disagree with this account, but has a more substantial story to tell. These identifications are not (cannot be) mechanical, disembodied actions – rather, they are grounded in ancestral, natural human practices, such as sorting and arranging objects. A simple example, in essence Fogelin’s [1987], should illustrate this point. Suppose we describe to a child the 3 times 3 operation by the following arrangement:


■    ■    ■

■    ■    ■

■    ■    ■

Next, suppose we produce another arrangement


■       ■ ■       ■

and tell her that this also describes the 3 × 3 operation. Thus, the identity ‘3 × 3 = 9’ is the rule that the two descriptions are correct and they say the same thing (that is, are ‘identical’, to use Fogelin’s terminology). So, we hope, the child understands that three batches of three objects amount to nine objects.

Now suppose that a few days later the child no longer remembers all the details of this story and conceives of the 3 × 3 multiplication as follows:


■   1.

■   2.


She counts the squares, and reports the result: 7. We protest, and the child gets confused. Her puzzlement originates in her belief that she generated arrangement (c) by doing the same thing we did initially – she considered three batches of three objects, and then counted the objects!

This simple example signals a more serious problem. We recognize here one version of the well-known rule-following ‘paradoxes’ in PI highlighted by Kripke [1982] many years ago: “any course of action can be made out to accord with the rule”, and thus “no course of action could be determined by a rule." (PI §201) It is impossible to draw a list containing all the directives needed to follow a rule, and no matter what one does, there is an interpretation of one’s actions that makes them accord with the rule. In our case, one just can’t draw a list containing everything that is, and is not, allowed in the manipulation of the little black squares when describing the 3 × 3 operation – thus clearing up all possible confusions. (This is easy to see: suppose one proposes as a regress-stopper adding a rule explicitly excluding superpositions. But this won’t work, since yet another Goodmanesque-Kripkean scenario can be invented in which an arrangement is obtained ‘showing’ that, say, 3×3 = 33 because, for instance, one misunderstands what superposition is. And so on. See Goodman [1955], Kripke [1982].)

In essence, here Wittgenstein would urge that it is just a brute fact of nature that we are indeed able to avoid this situation, and sort out our confusion, especially after the teachers intervene and signal the mistake we made. To emphasize, it is a brute fact that when people are asked to represent the multiplication 3 × 3, the (a)-type and (b)-type arrangements predominate, while those of the (c)-type are very rare, and even more so after training.

More generally, it is a given of the human forms of life that we are able to follow rules and orders; that there is a point when we stop ‘interpreting’ them – and just act. Thus, crucial here is our ability to act ‘blindly’ when following directions, as Wittgenstein puts it (PI §219) – that is, blind to “distractions” (Stern [2004, 154-155]), to all the so numerous possibilities to stray away. Were we not able to act this way, were the confusions (such as the ones described above) overwhelmingly prevalent, then the arithmetical practice would not exist to begin with. (It is instructive to peruse Stern’s critique of Fogelin’s [1994, 219-20] misreading of PI §219. But see also Fogelin [2009] for more on these matters.)

So, as a result of training, the child becomes able to recognize that, as Fogelin notes [1987, 215], despite superficial similarities arrangement (c) is not the result of doing ‘the same thing’ we did initially ((a) and (b)). While this might be distressing, there is no guarantee that the child will reach this stage in understanding. Moreover, the process is gradual: some children ‘get it’ faster than others. The immersion in the community of ‘mathematicians’, the continual checking and correcting, the social pressure (through low grades), and so forth, help the children master the technique of distinguishing what is allowed from what is not, to differentiate what must be ‘turned a blind eye on’ from what really matters.  The arithmetical training consists in inculcating in children a certain technique to deploy when presented with situations of the kind discussed here: they understand multiplication when they are able to establish (and recognize) the identity of various descriptions.

The squares example can be invoked to illustrate Wittgenstein’s position regarding formalism. The arithmetical identities are not reducible to mere manipulations of symbols, but come embedded into, and govern the relations of, (arrangement) practices. The arithmetical training consists not only in having the pupils learn the allowed strings of symbols (the multiplication table) by heart, but also, more importantly, in inculcating in them a certain reaction when presented with arrangements of the kind discussed above.

At this point, two aspects of the issue should be distinguished. The first is purely descriptive. In terms of what people actually do, the ‘normal’ situations (arrangements of (a)-type and (b)-type) prevail after training, while the ‘deviant’ ones (arrangements of the (c)-type) are the exception. This is an empirical regularity: with training, most people get the arrangements right most of the time.

The second aspect is normative: this empirical regularity becomes a candidate to be codified into a special form. By doing this, we thus grant it a new status, that of a norm, or rule – an arbiter of ‘right’ and ‘wrong.' We say that it is incorrect to take an arrangement like (c) to stand for the 3 times 3 operation. The empirical regularity, the uniform application of the technique of multiplication, is thus ‘hardened’ into a rule. When discussing multiplication in LFM X, p. 95, Wittgenstein says the following:

I say to [the trainee], “You know what you’ve done so far. Now do the same sort of thing for these two numbers.”—I assume he does what we usually do. This is an experiment—and one which we may later adopt as a calculation. What does that mean? Well, suppose that 90 per cent do it all one way. I say, “This is now going to be the right result.” The experiment was to show what the most natural way is—which way most of them go. Now everybody is taught to do it—and now there is a right and wrong. Before there was not.

To indicate the change of status, Wittgenstein uses several suggestive metaphors. The first is the road building process:

It is like finding the best place to build a road across the moors. We may first send people across, and see which is the most natural way for them to go, and then build the road that way. (LFM, p. 95)

Here, building the road is a decision, but not an arbitrary one: different crossing paths have been taken over time, but usually one is most often travelled, and thus preferred on a regular basis. It is this one that gradually emerges as the most suited for crossing, and the one which the lasting road will follow.

The second metaphor is legalistic: we regard an empirical regularity as a mathematical proposition when we “deposit [it] in the archives” (LFM, p. 104). Note that what is now in the archives has previously been in circulation, ‘out there’, had a genuine life. On the other hand, what is in the archives is protected, withdrawn from circulation – that is, not open to change and dispute. The relations between the archived items are frozen, solidified. (Note the normative role of archives as well: it is illegal to tamper with them.)

A related metaphor we already encountered above is that of the physical process of condensation: just as an amount of vapor enters a qualitatively different form of aggregation turning into a drop of water, so the empirical-behavioral regularities are turned into arithmetical rules. What happens is that these regularities are ‘condensed’ or, to use Wittgenstein’s own word, “hardened”:

It is as if we had hardened the empirical proposition into a rule. And now we have, not an hypothesis that gets tested by experience, but a paradigm with which experience is compared and judged. And so a new kind of judgment. (RFM VI-22)

The elevation to a new status (performed because of the robust, natural agreement) is indicated by archiving:


Because they all agree in what they do, we lay it down as a rule, and put it in the archives. Not until we do that have we got to mathematics. One of the main reasons for adopting this as a standard, is that it’s the natural way to do it, the natural way to go – for all these people. (LFM, p. 107)

5. Regularities, Rules, Agreement, and Contingency

Wittgenstein’s emphasis on conceiving mathematics as essentially presupposing human practices and human language should not be taken as an endorsement of a form of subjectivism of the sort right-is-what-I-(my-community)-take-to-be-right. Thus, interestingly, there is a sense in which Wittgenstein actually agrees with the line taken by Hardy, Frege and other Platonists insisting on the objectivity of mathematics. What Wittgenstein opposes is not objectivity per se, but the ‘philosophical’ explanation of it. The alternative account he proposes is that arithmetical identities emerge as a special codification of these contingent but extremely robust, objectively verifiable behavioral regularities. (Yet, recall that although the arithmetical propositions owe their origin and relevance to the existence of such regularities, they belong to a different order.) So, what Wittgenstein rejects is a certain “metaphysics of objectivity” (Gerrard [1996, 173]). In essence, he rejects the idea that mathematics is transcendent, that an extra-layer of ‘mathematical reality’ is the ultimate judge of what is proved, here and now, by human means. (“We know as much as God does in mathematics” (LFM, p. 104)) Therefore, from this perspective, progress in explaining Wittgenstein’s conception consist in clarifying how he manages to account for the “peculiar inexorability of mathematics” (RFM I-4), while avoiding both Platonism and subjectivism.

A good starting point for this task is understanding Wittgenstein’s view of the relation between mathematical and empirical statements. Unlike some philosophers oftentimes compared with him (such as Quine), he takes mathematical propositions to be non-revisable in light of empirical investigation (“mathematics as such is always measure, not thing measured” RFM, III-75). To see the larger relevance of this point, consider the simple question ‘What if, by putting together two pebbles and other three pebbles, we get sometimes five, sometimes six, and sometimes even four pebbles?’ Importantly, this state of affairs would not be an indication that 2+3=5 is false – and thus needs revision. This situation would only show that pebbles are not good for demonstrating (and teaching) addition. The mathematical identity is untouchable (as it were), and the only option left to us is to suspect that maybe the empirical context is abnormal. Thus, the next step is to ask whether we face the same anomalies when we use other objects, such as fruits, pencils, books, bottles, fingers, and so forth.

So, let us explore, for a moment, for the sake of the argument, the scenario in which a large variety of ordinary items is subject to this strange variation. Under this assumption, the conclusion to draw is a radical one: were this scenario real, the arithmetical practice of summing could not have even gotten off the ground. This would be the situation defining the supreme pointlessness of arithmetic, which would thus become a mere game of symbols. In such a situation, the truth or falsity of the identity 2+3 = 5 would no longer matter, as it is, in a sense, meaningless. As Wittgenstein puts it,

I want to say: it is essential to mathematics that its signs are also employed in mufti. It is the use outside mathematics, and so the meaning of the signs that make the sign game into mathematics. (RFM IV-41)

The terms ‘sense’ and ‘nonsense’, rather than the terms ‘true’ and ‘false’, bring out the relation of mathematical to nonmathematical propositions. (Wittgenstein's Lectures, Cambridge 1932-35; hereafter AWL, p. 152)

However, the wild variation described above does not exist. It is a contingent, brute natural fact (again!) that we do not live in such a world, but in one in which regularities prevail. Moreover, it is precisely the existence of such regularities – together with, as we will see in a moment, regularities of human behaviour – that makes possible the arithmetical practice in the first place. Wittgenstein, however, realized this rather late, as Steiner [2009] documents. Remarks about the role of empirical regularities are entirely absent in PG and PR; so, according to Steiner, understanding the importance of the empirical regularities for mathematics amounts for Wittgenstein to a “silent revolution”, in addition to the well-known “overt revolution” (the repudiation of the Tractatus).

A closer look at the contingent regularity relevant in this context – behavioural agreement – is now in order. (At PI §206 and 207 Wittgenstein suggests that these regularities form the basis of language itself.) This type of agreement consists in all of us having, roughly, the same natural reactions when presented with the same ‘mathematically’ related situations (arranging, sorting, recognizing shapes, performing one-to-one correspondences, and so forth.) Its existence is supported by the already discussed facts: (i) we can be trained to have these reactions, and (ii) the world itself presents a certain stability, many regular features, including the regularity that people receiving similar training will react similarly in similar situations. (There surely is a neuro-physiological basis for this; cats, unlike dogs, cannot be trained to fetch.)

Yet, as stressed above, it is crucial to note that speaking in terms of behavioural agreement when it comes to understanding the mathematical enterprise should not lead one to believe that Wittgenstein is in the business of undermining the objectivity of mathematics. This is Dummett’s [1959] early influential line of interpretation, describing Wittgenstein as a “full-blooded conventionalist” (or even “anarchist”; this is Dummett’s [1978b, 64] famous label, when comparing Wittgenstein, “in his later phase” with the “Bolsheviks” Brouwer and Weyl.) According to him, Wittgenstein maintains that at any step in a calculation we could go any way we want – and the only reason that we go the way we usually go is an agreement between us, as the members of the community: in essence, a convention we all accept (And which, since it might be changed, is entirely contingent. Dummett [1978b, 67] writes: “What makes a […mathematical] answer correct is that we are able to agree in acknowledging it as correct." (Cited in Gerrard [1996, 197, fn. 43]).

Thus, one should say that a mathematical identity is true by convention; that is, it is taken, accepted as true by all calculators because a convention binds them. However, textual evidence can be amassed against this reading. Wittgenstein does not regard the agreement among the members of the community’s opinions on mathematical propositions as establishing their truth-value. Convincing passages illustrating this point can be found virtually everywhere in his later works, and Gerrard [1996] collects several of them.

In In PI II, xi, pp.226, Wittgenstein says that “Certainly the propositions ‘Human beings believe that twice two is four’ and ‘Twice two is four’ do not mean the same.” In LFM, p. 240, when talking about ‘mathematical responsibility’, he points out that “(...) one proposition is responsible to another. Given certain principles and laws of deduction, you can say certain things and not others." Some passages in LFM are most perspicuous: “Mathematical truth isn’t established by their all agreeing that it’s true” (p. 107); also, “it has often been put in the form of an assertion that the truths of logic are determined by a consensus of opinions. Is this what I am saying? No.” (p. p. 183).

So, it is simply not the case that the truth-value of a mathematical identity is established by convention. Yet behavioural agreement does play a fundamental role in Wittgenstein’s view. This is, however, not agreement in verbal, discursive behaviour, in the “opinions” of the members of the community. It is a different, deeper form of consensus – “of action” (LFM, p. 183; both italics in original), or agreement in “what [people] do” (LFM, p. 107). Tellingly, RFM, VI-30C reads: “The agreement of people in calculation is not an agreement in opinions or convictions.” In PI §241, this is spelled out as “not agreement in opinions but in form of life." Moreover, LFM contains passages like this:

There is no opinion at all; it is not a question of opinion. They are determined by a consensus of action: a consensus of doing the same thing, reacting in the same way. There is a consensus but it is not a consensus of opinion. We all act the same way, walk the same way, count the same way (p. 183-4)

The specific kind of behavioural agreement (in action) is a precondition of the existence of the mathematical practice. The agreement is constitutive of the practice; it must already be in place before we can speak of ‘mathematics.' The regularities of behaviour (we subsequently ‘harden’) must already hold. So, we do not ‘go on’ in calculations (or make up rules) as we wish: it is the existent regularities of behaviour (to be ‘hardened’) that bind us.

Thus, not much is left of the ‘full-blooded conventionalist’ idea. We don’t really have much freedom. Steiner [2009, 12] explains: the rules obtained from these regularities “are the only rules available. (The only degree of freedom is to avoid laying down these rules, not to adopt alternative rules. It is only in this sense that the mathematician is an inventor, not a discoverer.)” We can now see more clearly how this view contrasts with Dummett’s: mathematical identities are not true by convention, since they themselves are conventions, rules, elevated to this new status (‘archived’) from their initial condition of empirical regularities (Steiner [1996, 196]).

While the behavioural agreement constitutes the background for the arithmetical practice, Wittgenstein takes great care to keep it separated from the content of this practice (Gerrard [1996, 191]). As we saw, his view is that the latter (the relations between the already ‘archived’ items) is governed by necessity, not contingency; the background, however, is entirely contingent. As Gerrard observes, this distinction corresponds, roughly, to the one drawn in LFM, p. 241: “We must distinguish between a necessity in the system and a necessity of the whole system.” (See also RFM VI-49: “The agreement of humans that is a presupposition of logic is not an agreement in opinions on questions of logic.”) It is thus conceivable that the background might cease to exist; should it vanish, should people start disagreeing on a large scale on simple calculations or manipulations, then, as discussed, this would be the end of arithmetic – not a rejection of the truth of 2+3=5, but the end of ‘right’ (and ‘wrong’) itself, the moment when such an identity turns into a mere string of symbols whose truth would not matter more than, say, the truth of ‘chess bishops move diagonally.' (Note that this rule is not grounded in a behavioural empirical regularity, but it is merely formal, and arbitrary.)

The very fact of the existence of this background is not amenable to philosophical analysis. The question ‘Why do we all act the same way when confronted with certain (mathematical) situations?’ is, for Wittgenstein, a request for an explanation, and it can only be answered by advancing a theory of empirical science (neurophysiology, perhaps, or evolutionary psychology). This is a question that he, qua philosopher, does not take to be his concern. He sees himself as being in the business of only describing this background, with the avowed goal of drawing attention to its existence and (overlooked) function.

Moreover, it now hopefully becomes clearer how his rejection of ‘philosophical’ explanations, still baffling many readers, is connected to his central strategy of dissolving (rather than solving) philosophical puzzles. (Recall Wittgenstein’s warnings about confusing philosophical questions with empirical ones in The Blue and Brown Books, p.18, 35 and the related diagnostic in RFM VI-31, “Our disease is one of wanting to explain.") When a philosophical explanation is advanced, it usually takes the Platonist form: “we all agree about mathematical identities because we all ‘grasp’ (‘look at’, are ‘guided by’, and so forth) the same (a-causal non-spatiotemporal) mathematical entities and their relations." But this explanation is preposterous – literally, it gets things in the wrong order. As Steiner puts it [1996, 192; emphasis added), “(w)hat Wittgenstein rejects in mathematical Platonism is not so much its doctrine that ‘mathematical objects exist’, but the illusion it fosters that the existence of mathematical objects, and of a special faculty of intuiting them can explain the extraordinary agreement among mathematicians – of all cultures – about what propositions have been proved. To the contrary, Wittgenstein argues, the ‘great’ and ‘surprising’ agreement among mathematicians underlies mathematics; indeed, makes it possible. But the task of philosophy is, and can be, only to describe, not explain, the fundamental role of the regularity of human mathematical behaviour.”

Related to Platonism, ‘mentalism’ is another target of Wittgenstein, as Putnam [1996] notes. This is the idea that rules are followed (and calculations made) because there is something that ‘guides’ the mind in these activities. If we recall the black squares example, the guide must play the role of a regress-stopper, constituting the explanation as to how all possible interpretations and distractions are averted. The mind and this guide form an infallible mechanism delivering the result. This is a supermechanism, as Putnam calls it, borrowing Wittgenstein’s own way to characterize the proposal. (Wittgenstein talks about ‘super-concepts’ at PI §97b, ‘super-likeness’ at PI §389, and so forth.) Putnam [1996, 245-6] makes the point as follows: “Wittgenstein shows that while the words used in philosophers’ explanations of rule following may sometimes hit it off – for example, it is perfectly true that a rule determines the results of a calculation – the minute we suppose that some entity or process has been described that explains How We Are Able to Follow Rules, then we slip into thinking that we have discovered a ‘supermechanism’; moreover, if we try to take these super-mechanisms seriously we fall into absurdities. Wittgenstein sometimes indicates the general character of such ‘explanations’ by putting forward parodistic proposals, for example, that what happens when we follow a rule is that the mind is guided by invisible train tracks (§218), ‘lines along which [the rule] is to be followed through the whole of space’ (§219).”

6. Concluding Remarks

In 1944, Wittgenstein assessed that his “chief contribution has been in the philosophy of mathematics” (Monk [1990, 466]). According to P.M.S. Hacker, Wittgenstein’s reflections on mathematics are his “least influential and least understood” part of his later philosophy [1996, 295]. Later Wittgenstein’s philosophy of mathematics is indeed difficult to characterize and classify, especially within the framework of academic schools. (For instance, while the tendency to call him today an ‘antirealist’ appears to be well supported by textual evidence, one should not ignore the attempts to identify ‘realist’ tendencies in his work. See Diamond [1991] and Conant [1997] for discussions of Wittgenstein’s location within the broader realist-antirealist landscape). Thus there is ample room for further discussion of his views, and especially for clarifying how his philosophy of mathematics complements, or even augments, his relatively better understood philosophy of language and mind. The relation between his view of mathematics and that of the professional mathematicians is yet another interesting and potentially controversial matter worth of further study – for, if we are to believe him,

A mathematician is bound to be horrified by my mathematical comments, since he has always been trained to avoid indulging in thoughts and doubts of the kind I develop. He has learned to regard them as something contemptible and… he has acquired a revulsion from them as infantile. That is to say, I trot out all the problems that a child learning arithmetic, and so forth, finds difficult, the problems that education represses without solving. I say to those repressed doubts: you are quite correct, go on asking, demand clarification! (PG 381, 1932)

7. References and Further Reading

For comprehensive bibliographical sources, see Sluga and Stern [1996] and Floyd [2005], and, for material available online, see Rodych [2008] and Biletzki and Matar [2009].

a. Wittgenstein's Writings

  • Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, [1922], London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1961; translated by D.F. Pears and B.F. McGuinness.
  • (PI) Philosophical Investigations, [1953]. [2001], 3rd ed., Oxford: Blackwell Publishing. The German text, with a revised English translation by G. E. M. Anscombe.
  • (RFM) Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics, [1991], MIT Press: Cambridge Massachusetts and London, England (paperback edition) [1956] 1st ed. Edited by G.H. von Wright, R. Rhees and G.E.M. Anscombe (eds.); translated by G.E.M Anscombe.
  • (PG) Philosophical Grammar, [1974], Oxford: Basil Blackwell; Rush Rhees, (ed.); translated by Anthony Kenny.
  • (PR) Philosophical Remarks, [1975], Oxford: Basil Blackwell; Rush Rhees, (ed.); translated by Raymond Hargreaves and Roger White.
  • (RPP) Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, [1980], Vol. I, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, G.E.M. Anscombe and G.H. von Wright, (eds.), translated by G.E.M. Anscombe.
  • (BB) The Blue and Brown Books, [1964], [1958] 1st ed. Oxford: Blackwell
  • (AWL) Ambrose, Alice, (ed.), [1979], Wittgenstein's Lectures, Cambridge 1932-35: Ed. A. Ambrose, Totowa: NJ: Littlefield and Adams.
  • (LFM) Diamond, Cora, (ed.), [1976], Wittgenstein's Lectures on the Foundations of Mathematics, Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press.
  • (WVC) Waismann, Friedrich, [1979], Wittgenstein and the Vienna Circle, Oxford: Basil Blackwell; edited by B.F. McGuinness; translated by Joachim Schulte and B.F. McGuinness.

b. Other Sources

  • Anderson, A.R., [1958], ‘Mathematics and the “Language Game”’, The Review of Metaphysics II, 446-458.
  • Balaguer, Mark [1998], Platonism and Anti-Platonism in Mathematics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bays, Timothy, [2004], “On Floyd and Putnam on Wittgenstein on Gödel,” Journal of Philosophy, CI.4, April: 197-210.
  • Benacerraf, Paul, [1973], “Mathematical Truth”, Journal of Philosophy, 70(19): 661–679.
  • Benacerraf, Paul and Putnam, Hilary (eds.), [1983] 2nd ed., Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Readings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. ([1964] 1st ed.)
  • Bernays, Paul, [1935], “On Platonism in Mathematics”, Reprinted in Benacerraf and Putnam [1983].
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Author Information

Sorin Bangu
University of Bergen

The Aesthetic Attitude

Aesthetics is the subject matter concerning, as a paradigm, fine art, but also the special, art-like status sometimes given to applied arts like architecture or industrial design or to objects in nature. It is hard to say precisely what is shared among this motley crew of objects (often referred to as aesthetic objects), but the aesthetic attitude is supposed to go some way toward solving this problem. It is, at the very least, the special point of view we take toward an object that results in our having an aesthetic experience (an experience of, for example, beauty, sublimity, or even ugliness). Many aesthetic theories, however, have taken it to play a central role in defining the boundary between aesthetic and non-aesthetic objects. These theories, usually called aesthetic attitude theories, argue that when we take the aesthetic attitude toward an object, we thereby make it an aesthetic object.

These theories originate in the notion of disinterest that was investigated by eighteenth-century aesthetic thinkers. While important to these thinkers, the idea of disinterest becomes even more crucial in the aesthetic theories of Kant and Schopenhauer. In these two philosophers, especially the latter, we begin to find aesthetic attitude theories. In the twentieth century, some major thinkers adopted the aesthetic attitude as a fundamental notion, but did not do so without facing serious criticism. Indeed, aesthetic attitude theories are not as popular as they once were, due to this criticism and to a more general shift of focus.

Table of Contents

  1. The Aesthetic Attitude
    1. Introductory Clarifications
    2. Disinterest
    3. Appreciation for Its Own Sake
  2. Historical Underpinnings
    1. Eighteenth-Century British Philosophers
    2. Kant
    3. Schopenhauer
  3. Twentieth-Century Aesthetic Attitude Theories
    1. Bullough and Psychical Distance
    2. Stolnitz
    3. Scruton
  4. Criticism
    1. Against Aesthetic Attitude Theories
    2. In Defense of Aesthetic Attitude Theories
    3. Where to Go From Here
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Aesthetic Attitude

There are two parts to the aesthetic attitude: the aesthetic part, and the attitude part. Here, an attitude is a certain state of mind. In particular, it is a way of approaching experiences or orienting oneself toward the world. It may help to think of someone with an optimistic attitude. He has a tendency to see things in a positive light. With the aesthetic attitude, the thought is not that there are certain people who generally see things, so to speak, in an aesthetic light, but more aligned with what is meant by the request that someone “have a more optimistic attitude” or “take a more positive attitude” about a given circumstance. We are asked, in such situations, to make ourselves attend in a certain way. In adopting an optimistic attitude, we focus on features of the situation that we can spin positively – we may realize the bad things are not really so bad and look instead for a silver lining. In adopting the aesthetic attitude, we focus on features of the situation that we think are relevant aesthetically – we may stop thinking about where we are parked and instead begin following the plot and the character development of the play being performed before us.

As these examples suggest, the aesthetic attitude is supposed to be a frame of mind that we can adopt more or less when we choose to. Of course, difficulties can arise for lots of reasons. A cell phone that rings during a symphony is reviled because it inevitably grabs our attention, and problems may arise adopting the aesthetic attitude, too, if we are distracted by hunger or unable to resist work-related worries. Thus, the analogy to optimism may be apt in a further way. It seems much easier for some people to adopt an optimistic attitude than it is for others, and many philosophers have thought that some people have a knack for taking the aesthetic attitude where others find it harder.

a. Introductory Clarifications

There are paradigm cases where we adopt the aesthetic attitude, for example, in a museum or as a spectator at the theater. It is, however, important to realize that the aesthetic attitude is not simply an attitude we take in museums, but one that we can take toward nature, too. Finding the colors of a sunset or the complexity of a nautilus beautiful means directing an aesthetic attitude toward the sunset or the nautilus and thinking about it aesthetically. Indeed, many have argued that we can take the aesthetic attitude toward anything at all, and in doing so, make it an aesthetic object. A street scene, though we would not describe it as art or nature, could thus be approached aesthetically. Since there are things that we can take the aesthetic attitude toward that are not art, the aesthetic attitude is not just an artistic attitude. It is much broader than that.

Not only can we take the aesthetic attitude toward things that are not art, but we can also take it toward things that are not beautiful. Some art is ugly, and certain artworks even flaunt their ugliness for artistic effect. In fact, calling something ugly is giving it an aesthetic evaluation, which in turn requires taking the aesthetic attitude toward it. So, in adopting the aesthetic attitude, say, toward a sunset, you start to look at the aesthetic features of the sunset. For example, you might pay attention to the visual composition of the landscape and view, or perhaps to the soft color gradations. Upon inspecting these elements, you might actually come to find them unsatisfactory. You might notice a traffic jam, a patch of large, barren trees, or a few unappealing vapor trails left by planes. You might reasonably conclude that it was, upon further inspection, kind of an ugly sunset. This conclusion could only be reached by looking at the scene aesthetically, that is, adopting the aesthetic attitude toward the scene. This makes it clear that we adopt the aesthetic attitude not only toward beautiful things, but also toward ugly things. Indeed, we must adopt the aesthetic attitude if any conclusion about a thing’s beauty or ugliness, in other words its aesthetic standing, is to be reached.

While these remarks make it clear that taking the aesthetic attitude toward something is not the same as finding it beautiful, it is a matter of debate whether the aesthetic attitude involves some kind of pleasure. We have seen that it does not necessarily involve straightforward aesthetic enjoyment or positive aesthetic evaluation, but it might still involve some broader kind of enjoyment, pleasure, or satisfaction. Whether it does and what kind exactly is something to be spelled out by the particular aesthetic attitude theory.

As mentioned above, many reserve the term ‘aesthetic attitude theory’ for a theory according to which aesthetic objects are properly distinguished from non-aesthetic objects by our ability to take the aesthetic attitude toward them. Not everyone agrees on this classification of aesthetic attitude theories, but there is sufficient consensus for us to assume it here. Given that, it may be helpful at the outset to point out that aesthetic attitude theories have experienced waning popularity in the past few decades. This may be due to criticism of the theory or to other theories that offer alternative accounts of the relevant distinction, both of which will be canvassed below.

Before continuing, a word of caution may be helpful. The term ‘aesthetic’ is applied to many things: we have already seen aesthetic attitude, aesthetic objects, and aesthetic experience, but philosophers also talk about aesthetic evaluations and aesthetic judgments (for example, judging that something is beautiful), aesthetic features (for example, symmetry), aesthetic contemplation, aesthetic emotions, and so on. Many of these will come up here, but the important thing to keep in mind is that this is just how philosophers refer to the special class of experiences, judgments, emotions, and so forth. that pertains to the art-like realm discussed above. Different theorists take different views of how these notions relate to each other and which is the most basic, but all take as an aim the discussion of the special sphere of the aesthetic.

b. Disinterest

There are two ways of thinking about the aesthetic attitude that have been most prevalent. First, it has been thought of as a special kind of disinterested attitude. The person who adopts the aesthetic attitude does not view (hear, taste, and so forth) objects with some kind of personal interest, that is, with a view to what that object can do for her, broadly speaking. A collector may view an expensive painting she owns and praise herself for owning such a rare and pricey piece. We might say that, in such a case, she takes an economic attitude toward the painting, but she without a doubt fails to think about it aesthetically. If she were instead viewing the painting contemplatively, thinking about its composition, meaning, and so on, then she would be thinking about it aesthetically, and that seems to be due to her disinterested attitude toward it. Similarly, a music student taking a music theory test might listen for certain particular keys or chord progressions, but he seems to listen to the music with the goal of getting a good grade on his test, rather than listen to the music simply to enjoy it, or for the experience of listening to it.

For many, disinterest is only a necessary condition of the aesthetic attitude, so that an attitude’s being disinterested does not guarantee that it is an aesthetic attitude. Something else may have to be present. A court judge will approach a trial with disinterest in this sense. He will try to be impartial and not let any personal feelings or goals cloud his judgment, but he does not thereby approach the trial aesthetically. Something else about his attitude would have to be present.

Furthermore, having this kind of disinterested attitude toward something by no means precludes finding it interesting. If the collector, in her more contemplative state, finds the interactions among a certain cluster of figures especially meaningful, then we can describe her as interested in those figures. This does not mean, however, that she is interested in them for some external purpose. Disinterestedness, then, does not indicate complete lack of interest (finding something uninteresting), but a lack of personal investment or goal-directed interest.

c. Appreciation for Its Own Sake

Suppose now that the music student above were instead listening to the music simply to enjoy it or just for the experience of listening to it. We might say that he was listening to the music for its own sake. This suggests the second traditional way of characterizing the aesthetic attitude. According to this way of thinking about it, the aesthetic attitude involves considering or appreciating something (for example an artwork) for its own sake. This means that we want to experience the work, not because it fulfills some desire for something else, but just because we want to have that experience. So a museum-goer may spend time in the Egyptian art galleries in order to make her son happy, but she may spend time in Islamic art galleries simply because she wants to look at and experience Islamic art, that is, she wants to see the objects for their own sake and not for the sake of anything beyond or outside of them. We will return to both of these traditional characterizations at greater length below.

Now that some idea of the nature of the aesthetic attitude is in place, we can turn to the development of the aesthetic attitude in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. After that, we will be appropriately placed to look at the three main twentieth-century aesthetic attitude theories and some of the criticisms that have been made of them.

2. Historical Underpinnings

Aesthetic attitude theories are marked by their general insistence on the fundamental importance of the aesthetic attitude. Some of these theories hold that the nature of art is explained by the aesthetic attitude. This is generally accepted as an insufficient way of setting the boundaries of art, for reasons we have already seen, since nature, too, is a perfectly fine thing to take the aesthetic attitude toward. Most aesthetic attitude theories thus offer subtler and more complex accounts of the interaction among the aesthetic attitude, art, and beauty. Indeed, many of these philosophers have been keen on distinguishing a variety of different aesthetic qualities. In addition to beauty, they are interested in sublimity, novelty, charm, and so on.

There is no consensus regarding where exactly in the history of philosophy the aesthetic attitude first appears. The phrase ‘aesthetic attitude’ only appears in print very late in the nineteenth century, so some maintain that, before the twentieth century, there were no aesthetic attitude theories properly speaking. Even granting this, there is still clear historical precedent for the theory, and in spirit these historical theories bear a great deal of resemblance to the later aesthetic attitude theories.

Tracing the aesthetic attitude theory back to its origins, we may find its clearest early ancestor in the eighteenth-century notion of disinterest. This is to be found among a group of British thinkers writing about beauty and taste. Among these, Lord Shaftesbury is probably the earliest to discuss the notion in any real depth. The next important figure is Immanuel Kant, who wrote his three critiques at the end of the eighteenth century, the third of which, the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), is devoted to his theory of aesthetics and teleology. The final seminal figure is Arthur Schopenhauer, whose book The World as Will and Representation (1844) discusses aesthetic contemplation at length. It is in Schopenhauer that some notion of the aesthetic attitude is most noticeable and the similarities to modern theories most apparent. This section will provide an overview of the classical sources of aesthetic attitude theories, starting from their seeds in eighteenth-century British theories of taste, through Kant, and up to Schopenhauer.

a. Eighteenth-Century British Philosophers

The relationship between the aesthetic attitude and eighteenth-century British theories of taste is a subject of debate. Some philosophers, like Jerome Stolnitz, argue that there is a deep continuity, and that, really, these British philosophers have the same essential views as other classical aesthetic attitude theorists like Kant and Schopenhauer. Others, like George Dickie, have argued that there is an important divide between the two groups of theories. The details of the debate aside, it is hard to deny any connection. At the very least, these British philosophers influenced Kant and thus, either directly or indirectly, inspired everyone who has written about the aesthetic attitude since.

Several important British philosophers wrote about aesthetics and art. Shaftesbury, Francis Hutcheson, and David Hume, among yet others, wrote prominently about beauty and taste. Their theories are often referred to as theories of taste because they each essentially involve the notion of a special kind of faculty, the faculty of taste, that we use to determine an object’s aesthetic value. This faculty is generally taken to be naturally better in some than in others, though we can do things to improve it (expose ourselves to variety, learn about the artistic medium, and so on). Later British theorists, such as Edmund Burke, argued against such a faculty, worrying that it failed to really explain anything.

Most importantly, it is in these theories that we first find the notion of disinterest (though in Hume it appears as a lack of “prejudice”). Each of these philosophers argued that aesthetic appreciation involves disinterested pleasure. Despite slight differences among their notions of disinterest, the general idea is clear. When we are disinterested, we do not regard the aesthetic object as a tool for serving our own interests. One might wonder, however, whether it is independent from all other interests and all other values.

Shaftesbury argues that aesthetic experience is disinterested, but has a Platonic picture on which beauty is essentially the same as goodness and truth. Aesthetic appreciation is thus not devoid of any connection whatsoever to other values (ethical and epistemological), despite lacking connection to our personal ends and interests. For him, appreciating something aesthetically involves the same essential feeling as appreciating something morally. Shaftesbury does not, however, have a proper aesthetic attitude theory according to the above classification. His view is not one according to which our approaching something aesthetically makes it an aesthetic object. Beauty, along with morality and truth, are independent of our minds, though it is through taking the aesthetic attitude that we are able to recognize them. Shaftesbury may think that these things depend on the mind of God, but they certainly do not depend on us.

Hutcheson and Hume, on the other hand, disagree with Shaftesbury’s unified view. Both reject the equivalence of beauty, goodness, and truth, and see more of a gap between aesthetic value and other values. The details of Hutcheson and Hume differ, but both adopt Shaftesbury’s stress on disinterest. This is the crucial point on which all three theorists agree: they all share the central idea of disinterested pleasure as independent from personal interest, and it is this notion that forms the starting point for aesthetic attitude theories.

b. Kant

Kant is the next place to look for a theory of the aesthetic attitude. He takes up the notion of our judgments of beauty, but seems to follow earlier suspicions about a special faculty of taste. He opts instead to make his central notion that of aesthetic judgments, also called judgments of taste or judgments of the beautiful. His task is then to explain what exactly these are and how we make them. According to Kant, aesthetic judgments involve four important aspects. They must be disinterested, be universal, exhibit purposiveness without purpose, and be necessary. This article will focus mainly on disinterestedness, as it is there that we see most clearly the connection to the aesthetic attitude. A brief explanation of the other three will be included, as well, in order to present a clearer picture of the overall view. (See also the article on Kant’s Aesthetics.)

The first necessary condition regards the quality that our judgments of taste have. This is not quality in the sense of their being good or bad, accurate or inaccurate, or so on. Instead, by the quality of such judgments, Kant means their nature, what they are like and what they feel like. Kant points out, first, that all judgments of taste are essentially subjective. They come from our feelings, not from any objective fact that exists out in the world. He then argues that there are three kinds of satisfaction: that which we take in the agreeable, the beautiful, and the good, and he uses the contrasts to better clarify the nature of judgments of taste.

First, the agreeable gratifies some desire. We find tea agreeable when we have a desire for tea. In this sense, the pleasure in the tea is interested, since it serves our purpose. Kant also points out that our finding it agreeable depends essentially on us and our psychology. This also means, though, that it is not up to us to choose what to find agreeable. Our psychologies determine what we find agreeable, and we cannot change what we desire simply by willing to. One cannot stop a craving, for example, just by choosing to stop, since cravings do not work that way.

Next, we come to the good. The good is esteemed and approved, and there is objective value set on it. We find being generous good when we set objective value on generosity or generous actions. Pleasure in the good is also interested, since, for Kant, reason determines what we find good. This is still a personal interest because each person has an interest in bringing about the good. The person who finds generosity good has an interest in bringing about a more generous world, for example, by being generous and encouraging other people to do so.

The beautiful, in contrast, is disinterested pleasure. The art collector who enjoys her artwork for its monetary value enjoys that work in an interested way, and thus has not taken the aesthetic attitude toward it. Consequently, any positive judgment she produces will not be a judgment of taste. Kant takes this idea further, arguing that anyone who really approaches something with a contemplative, disinterested attitude and finds it beautiful (that is, takes the aesthetic attitude toward it) will not even be interested in whether the object in fact exists. To want the object to exist is to have an interest wrapped up in it, or in other words, to have something be at stake in its existence. Kant illustrates his point with a helpful example. Imagine a conversation in which one person asks another whether he finds a certain palace beautiful. He answers by saying that he dislikes things made on the backs and at the expense of the proletariat, or that he would never want such a thing for himself. These are cases where the palace’s existence is offensive or undesirable. The man has simply not answered the question of its beauty. The man has not taken an aesthetic attitude toward it. This is what Kant means when he says that the object’s existence cannot factor into the judgment. The aesthetic attitude is related to these remarks in that we must have a certain frame of mind, that is, a disinterested one, in order to make aesthetic judgments.

There are three other conditions of judgments of taste. They must be universal, which just means that they feel as though they apply to everyone. Calling something beautiful means feeling like everyone should recognize it as beautiful (even if we realize that it is not a fact about the object that it is beautiful). The objects of these judgments also exhibit what Kant calls purposiveness without purpose, or alternatively, finality without an end (a translation offered by Creed Meredith). This may sound complex, but it just means that, while there may be no actual purpose of the object (or at least, not one of which we are aware), we are struck by how it seems to be made for a purpose. For example, though we may not know why a plant’s leaves are arranged in angles echoing the Fibonacci sequence, we notice a certain pattern and appreciate the purposiveness there. If, though, the actual purpose entered our judgment, then we would have the beginnings of interested pleasure, which Kant has argued cannot be aesthetic. Finally, these judgments are also necessary in the sense that it feels like we judge according to some unspoken universal rule, from which our judgment necessarily follows.

Above, we saw that Kant takes aesthetic judgments to be subjective. However, the bigger picture reveals a more nuanced view. Such judgments come from our feelings of pleasure, but only when we take that pleasure to be universal, necessary, and felt in response to purposiveness rather than purpose. The universality, necessity, and reaction to the appearance of purpose (and not to actual purpose) exist only because our pleasure is disinterested. It is precisely when we experience this kind of subjective yet disinterested pleasure that we think these judgments hold universally and necessarily. Thus disinterest, a notion first brought to the fore by the eighteenth-century British philosophers, continues to be a central notion in Kant’s aesthetics. However, Kant does not seem to have a true aesthetic attitude theory in the sense defined above. It is a matter of interpretation, but it looks as though he does not think that any object we approach with this frame of mind thereby becomes an aesthetic object. Many argue that it is not until Schopenhauer, for whom disinterest is even more important, that we see an actual aesthetic attitude theory.

c. Schopenhauer

The notion of the aesthetic attitude may not appear fully formed until Schopenhauer, in Book III of The World as Will and Representation. Schopenhauer does not use the term ‘aesthetic attitude’, either, but instead talks about aesthetic contemplation. His understanding of this form of contemplation, however, is clearly related to twentieth-century aesthetic attitude theories, and as such he is generally looked to as the historical philosopher whose view is closest to the contemporary versions of the theory

To understand his view of the aesthetic attitude, it helps to know a little bit about Schopenhauer’s philosophy. He understands life as driven by the Will, which is a kind of unceasing desire and forms the basis of perpetual human suffering. When we desire something, we suffer in not having it. If we were to obtain all the things we desired, we would be overcome with boredom, a deeper and more poignant suffering. Experiencing the world in this way is experiencing the world as Will. However, he sees a few ways out of this. The most permanent solution is to adopt a severe ascetic outlook and stop having desires at all, but a temporary solution is to be found in aesthetic contemplation, where we experience the world as representation rather than as Will.

In a famous passage (section 34), Schopenhauer describes a few things that go along with the aesthetic attitude (although, again, he does not use this term). We may then begin to see how this contemplative state can release us from the cycle of suffering. First, we do not look at things in the ordinary way. This is generally accepted as having both a perceptual meaning and a non-perceptual one. There is a special aesthetic mode of perception where we attend much more fully to the surface features of an object. However, we also typically look at something with an eye to its relationships to other things. Schopenhauer argues that this boils down to looking at it with an eye to how it might help our own goals, that is, relate to our wills. In the aesthetic attitude, though, this relational viewing is completely absent, and we only pay attention to things themselves. Second, we do not have in mind abstract thought or reasoning, but instead focus on the perception alone. Here Schopenhauer says that the representation fills our mind and we are thus filled with calm contemplation. In this way, we stop thinking about the will and, since the perception takes up all of our mental ‘space’, we no longer sense a difference between ourselves and the object perceived. This means that, third, we will begin to see, in a sense, through the object itself to its Idea. So far, what this means is a bit opaque, but we can understand it in the following way. When we stop looking at the particular thing and what it might do for our own ends, we stop experiencing the world as related to our wills. Instead, we experience the world as representation. But these representations must be of something, and indeed they are representations of Ideas. These are similar to Plato’s Ideas or Forms: they are eternal and unchangeable. So when we contemplate things aesthetically, that is, take the aesthetic attitude toward things, we can know the Ideas. (It is, moreover, the aim of the aesthetic attitude to know the Ideas.)

Since everything represents Ideas and manifests the will in some way, anything can become the object of the aesthetic attitude. Not only does this mean that, according to our definition, Schopenhauer has an aesthetic attitude theory, but it also means that the aesthetic attitude has profound practical import. It can release us from the cycle of constant suffering, since we stop experiencing our wills in any way. Aesthetic contemplation also helps us deal with very real, very difficult situations. If we start to think aesthetically about the world, other people, and ourselves, then we will stop being angry, resentful, or sad (though we will also stop being excited or happy). We will instead see things that cause us pain as manifestations of the Idea of humanity, as nothing new or special. To put it a slightly different way, we will stop taking things personally. The vicissitudes of life will become just that, simply fluctuations through which we can have real encounters with Ideas.

It would be misleading to suggest that taking the aesthetic attitude is easy and comes naturally to everyone. It is even slightly misleading to call it aesthetic contemplation. Contemplation suggests passivity, but Schopenhauer argues that artistic geniuses can not only actively adopt the aesthetic attitude, but can also remain in that state for longer than the typical fleeting moment. They find beauty in all kinds of places and use art to communicate their insights to the rest of us. These views have inspired a debate about whether the aesthetic attitude (and aesthetic experience) is active or passive: whether we can make ourselves adopt this outlook and have aesthetic experiences, or whether they simply happen to us when the stars align just right. Schopenhauer answers that the aesthetic attitude is some mix of these, that certain people are more adept at engaging it actively, while it is a transient and happenstance state for others.

In Schopenhauer, we thus see a clear extension of the earlier notion of disinterest. In aesthetic contemplation, we stop thinking about the world and the objects in it as means to our ends, that is, as objects of our will. We also see attention and perception take center stage. Aesthetic contemplation, which can be active or passive, involves intense focus where the perception completely fills the mind. Finally, we see a crucial role for the aesthetic attitude in the larger theory. It helps us know Ideas, and by doing so, releases us from endless suffering. Many aspects of Schopenhauer’s view have resonated with subsequent philosophers of aesthetics. But in order to fully adopt his view, one must adopt much of the rest of his philosophy, that is, his theory of Ideas, representation, and the Will. Later aesthetic attitude theorists are generally unwilling to do this, but they still manage to preserve some key aspects of the view.

3. Twentieth-Century Aesthetic Attitude Theories

There are three prominent aesthetic attitude theorists in the twentieth century: Edward Bullough, Jerome Stolnitz, and Roger Scruton. Each of these three theorists tries to accomplish at least two major goals. First, each tries to give an intuitive definition of what the aesthetic attitude is, one that does not make the wrong attitudes (for example, interested ones) aesthetic attitudes but includes all the attitudes that do seem to be aesthetic. The second aim of each theory is to say something about the relationship between the aesthetic attitude and the philosophy of art and aesthetics more generally. In particular, they all use the aesthetic attitude to provide a definition of aesthetic objects, that is, to demarcate aesthetic objects from non-aesthetic ones.

a. Bullough and Psychical Distance

Bullough, a psychologist, is the first theorist here to use the term ‘aesthetic attitude’, but actually most often uses the interchangeable term ‘aesthetic consciousness’. His theory essentially involves disinterest, which he talks about as psychical distance. It is worth noting at the outset that his theory has not gained widespread support, though it has significantly contributed to the shaping of subsequent theories of the aesthetic attitude. We will see that his way of approaching and developing the notion of disinterest, though perhaps flawed, provides an interesting and evocative metaphor for aesthetic experience.

Bullough calls the central feature of aesthetic consciousness psychical distance, a metaphorical extension of spatial and temporal distance. We are all familiar with what it is to be distanced from something in space; it is just to be far away. Similarly, to be temporally distant from something is to exist, say, a hundred years after it. Bullough characterizes the experience of psychical distance as that of not being very emotionally close to or attached to something and not thinking about its practical role. His example is of a fog. Normally, a fog at sea causes us anxiety because it drastically reduces our field of vision, is associated with unexpected dangers, and is difficult to navigate. If, however, we take the aesthetic attitude toward it, we can direct our attention to its surface features. The fog may look soft and even palpable, and the air may feel peaceful and still. These latter sensations occur because we have been able to insert the proper psychical distance between ourselves and the fog.

This distance, Bullough says, is the result of putting the perceived object “out of gear” with our practical interests. Our practical ends should have no traction on our thoughts when we are properly distanced. We should not think about practical or personal concerns, but instead focus on the object itself. We also need, therefore, to be properly distanced from certain emotions, like those that concern our personal stake or even those that concern morality. That said, emotional response is still intimately involved in aesthetic consciousness and experience, but these emotions need to be generalized beyond our individual, particular feelings. So far, this sounds similar to the notion of disinterest discussed above. Bullough adds to this by explaining two ways distancing can go wrong.

We can fail to be properly distanced from a work if we are too psychically close to it or too psychically far away – that is, if we are too emotionally involved or too emotionally removed. Bullough refers to these conditions respectively as under-distancing and over-distancing. Under-distancing occurs when we are unable to separate our personal interests from what we experience. Suppose a jealous husband watches a performance of Othello and becomes increasingly suspicious, his rage building, and eventually only really sees himself and his wife instead of Othello and Desdemona. This man is under-distanced, since his emotions are too involved in the play’s action. On the other hand, imagine a brilliant satire of ancient Chinese society that we are now in very poor position to appreciate. This is a case of over-distancing. For many such works, the artwork may be sadly unable to engage our emotions sufficiently because we are too removed from it. Thus there is what Bullough terms a distance-limit, beyond which we are too far away to have aesthetic consciousness. He says that, practically speaking, people should err on the side of trying to distance themselves, since our tendency is to get too emotionally involved. What we should aim for, in theory, is the greatest distance without passing the distance-limit.

Here, we can see that spatial and temporal distance are not merely metaphors for psychical distance. We are too temporally removed to properly engage with the brilliant Chinese satire. Similarly, Bullough argues, being too spatially close to a work can make us unable to engage with it properly. This is in fact how he explains the relegation of culinary art to a second class art form. Since we have to taste these things and thus come into direct physical contact with them, we are simply unable to distance ourselves sufficiently from them.

Bullough also uses his theory to interesting effect in explaining why artists are sometimes censored, ostracized, or banned. Artists are better able to distance themselves than the average person, so they see more objects aesthetically. Non-artists, however, may look at the art and see only a hypersexualized youth (Nabokov’s Lolita), say, or a sacrilegious depiction of a holy figure (Serrano’s “Piss Christ”)

Many have found these implications implausible. Physical closeness to a work, for example, does not actually seem to preclude the proper psychical distance or disinterested attitude. There are further worries that, at best, Bullough only offers a necessary condition for the aesthetic attitude. Without something further, he ca not distinguish it from the court judge’s disinterested attitude. That said, Bullough is still an important figure in the development of aesthetic attitude theory. His development of a structured and explanatorily ambitious view set the tone for the aesthetic attitude theories that follow.

b. Stolnitz

For Stolnitz, the aesthetic attitude involves attending to something (anything) in a disinterested and sympathetic way, and doing so for its own sake. When we look at something in a disinterested way, we look at it non-instrumentally. This is just to say that we do not look at it as a means (as an instrument) to some other end. So, as above, the collector who admires her painting for its rarity fails to engage with her painting aesthetically. Similarly, the music student who looks for musical knowledge in the keys and chords of the symphony does not engage with it aesthetically. Interestingly, Stolnitz mentions that this also implies that the attitude of an art critic, either amateur or professional, is opposed to the aesthetic attitude. To see why this is so, it is enough to recognize that the critic has a goal: to form and pass judgment.

By including sympathy as a criterion of the aesthetic attitude, Stolnitz introduces the idea that the right attitude must take the artwork on its own terms. One needs to ignore personal conflicts and biases. The discovery that an artist was a miser should not change one’s aesthetic attitude toward the work, though it may give one pause when thinking morally about the artist. To up the ante, he argues that in order to view propaganda art or Nazi art with the proper aesthetic viewpoint, one will have to view it sympathetically, as well, and ignore the moral backdrop against which these things exist. (Nobody said that taking the aesthetic attitude was easy.) Failure to do so will taint any aesthetic experience that results, something we may be able to see in our occasional complaints to others that they “haven’t even given it a chance.” (To be clear, Stolnitz does not make and is not committed to any claims about the moral import of taking the aesthetic attitude in these difficult situations.)

Stolnitz understands attention, the third major component of his definition, as a kind of alert state. He agrees with predecessors that it is a kind of contemplation, but says that we have to understand contemplation in the right way. He agrees with Schopenhauer that the aesthetic attitude is not as passive as the term ‘contemplation’ suggests. (He disagrees, however, with Schopenhauer’s claim that only artistic geniuses can actively engage in aesthetic contemplation.) Aesthetic contemplation does not involve simply sitting back, relaxing, and letting the mind wander. It involves mental focus and thought, and such intense mental involvement may manifest itself in a tightening of muscles during a thrilling scene, a foot tapping to the beat, or a tilt of one’s head like the figure in a painting. Such physical manifestations are not required by the aesthetic attitude, but they exemplify the active, engaged mental state that itself does constitute the proper attitude.

Stolnitz is a proper aesthetic attitude theorist who argues that we can adopt the aesthetic attitude toward anything. He acknowledges that this implies that nothing is inherently unaesthetic. Stolnitz offers intuitive support for this view, pointing out that artists often approach ugly or boring objects with the aesthetic attitude and create something beautiful. A deformed and hideous bell pepper may, when approached in the right way, become a striking aesthetic object, as in the photographs of Edward Weston. Similarly, a humble shipping container or typeface may, when one takes the proper aesthetic attitude toward it, appear noble, subtle, and beautiful. So we can find traditionally ugly things aesthetic, but we can also find boring, everyday objects aesthetic when we approach them in the right way. It follows, moreover, from this view that neither art nor nature is inherently more aesthetic than the other. Since nothing is inherently unaesthetic, nothing in art is at an aesthetic disadvantage to anything in nature, and vice versa.

He also uses the aesthetic attitude to demarcate the bounds between things that count as aesthetically relevant and irrelevant, that is, what is and is not relevant to the aesthetic experience and to any verdict that may result from it. Thoughts that are compatible with disinterested, sympathetic attention can be aesthetically relevant as long as they do not divert attention away from the aesthetic object. Certain kinds of interpretation can thus count as aesthetically relevant or be ruled out as irrelevant. A poem might perfectly well suggest a cathedral without saying it explicitly. The thought of a cathedral that accompanies the poem is thus aesthetically relevant. However, it might also remind one of a personal experience, say, of one’s wedding that took place in a cathedral. This diverts attention away from the poem and is thus, argues Stolnitz, aesthetically irrelevant.

Stolnitz also applies these ideas to the problem of determining the aesthetic relevance of external facts. Such facts are aesthetically relevant when they (1) do not weaken our aesthetic attention, (2) pertain to the meaning or expressiveness of the object, and (3) enhance the quality of one’s aesthetic response. For example, it may be relevant to know that a certain painting is of the crucifixion of Jesus. It may, however, be irrelevant that Gauguin’s rendering of the Crucifixion does not accurately capture the story as it is told in the gospels. Perhaps the point is, so to speak, precisely to paint it in a different light.

Of all the theorists surveyed here, Stolnitz falls most squarely into our model of an aesthetic attitude theorist. His notion of the aesthetic attitude is completely explicit and forms the core of his theory. He uses it to define aesthetic objects and explain the aesthetic relevance of external thoughts and facts, as well as a host of related aesthetic issues.

c. Scruton

For Scruton, the aesthetic attitude has three main components. First, its goal is some kind of pleasure, enjoyment, or satisfaction. This means that, although the aesthetic attitude may not always in fact yield pleasure, it is our hope in taking such an attitude that it will. If we thought there were no enjoyment of any kind we could get out of an object, we would not attend to it aesthetically. The view should not be mistaken for what we might call aesthetic hedonism, the view that aesthetic value resides solely in a thing’s ability to give us pleasure. Pleasure should not be thought of too narrowly, either. Sad music can afford aesthetic satisfaction, as can paintings of violent scenes.

The aesthetic attitude must also involve attention to an object for its own sake. Scruton expresses dissatisfaction about how little the notion of ‘for its own sake’ has been explained by other theorists. To see this, consider that we know perfectly well what it means to do something for our own sake or for someone else’s sake. It is to do something with their interests in mind. What would attending to art for the sake of the art’s interests be, though? Scruton finds the particular phrase strange, but tries to find the kernel of insight in it. To be interested in something for its own sake involves a desire to go on experiencing it, but not in order to satisfy another, separate desire. This means that, if the art collector has a desire to look at her painting, and part of her desire to look at it is that she desires to admire its rarity, then she has not taken the aesthetic attitude. She is interested in it for its own sake only when there are no other desires she has that seeing the painting would satisfy.

Third and finally, the aesthetic attitude is normative. Normative just means that there is a certain kind of ‘should’-ness about it or that it explicitly or implicitly contains a value judgment. If a mother tells her son to be respectful, she makes a normative claim on him: that it is good to be respectful, and that he should do it. Furthermore, if she just notices that he is being disrespectful and disapproves, there is something normative involved in her disapproving reaction. The aesthetic attitude is normative in the sense that any judgment that comes out of the aesthetic attitude carries normative force. In other words, when we think that something is beautiful, we think that other people should find it beautiful, too. This is how Scruton, a self-proclaimed Kantian, sees himself as taking on Kant’s view above that aesthetic judgments are universal.

It is worth remarking that Scruton may not be talking about the aesthetic attitude as we have seen it so far. Until now, the aesthetic attitude has been understood as a state of mind or a kind of viewpoint that one can generally adopt at will, and that must exist prior to any aesthetic experience. Scruton writes, however, that the aesthetic attitudes are what we express when we make aesthetic judgments. This would mean that, in calling something beautiful, we make an aesthetic judgment and thus express an aesthetic attitude, namely, the aesthetic attitude we had when we judged or experienced the object as beautiful. While not a problem with his view, this means that he may not be talking about exactly the same thing as the earlier theorists. Among other things, this view leads to there being many different aesthetic attitudes, rather than just one special frame of mind or mode of perception that we are in when we have particular aesthetic experiences. Scruton’s definition may actually come closer to the normal meaning of ‘attitude’, in the way that we talk about an attitude of disapproval or an attitude of hope. Here, we find attitudes of beauty, elegance, loveliness, their opposites, and so on.

4. Criticism

In 1964, George Dickie offered a set of famous objections to aesthetic attitude theories. After Dickie, the aesthetic attitude has received very little attention outside Scruton, which may suggest a general acceptance of his objections. A few defenses of aesthetic attitude theories have been offered, but the literature has not stirred much since, indicating perhaps instead simply a waning interest in the topic.

a. Against Aesthetic Attitude Theories

In his well-known paper, “The Myth of the Aesthetic Attitude,” Dickie objects in turn to each of Bullough and Stolnitz’s theories. Dickie argues that the former thinks of distancing as a special kind of action that we can perform: we put ourselves “out of gear” with practical concerns. We can aim to and can successfully distance ourselves from perceived objects. These make distancing sound very much like an action. Dickie swiftly dismisses this view on the grounds that there really is no such special action. What really happens in such cases is that we attend differently, and attending is a perfectly normal and unmysterious action. One might worry about the details of Dickie’s argument here, but since Stolnitz’s view is the more nuanced and fully developed of the two, the majority of criticism is focused on his view.

Recall that, for Stolnitz, the aesthetic attitude involves a special kind of aesthetic perception: disinterested, sympathetic attention. Dickie focuses on the ‘disinterested’ part of this definition, noting first that ‘disinterested’ is an unhelpful clarification unless it means something to be ‘interested’. Stolnitz, so far, should be fine with this, and we may recall that he gives many cases of interested attention to clarify what disinterest amounts to.

In essence Dickie argues that there are really no cases of interested attention. Any alleged case of interested attention in fact falls into one of two categories: either it is not attention to the artwork at all; or it is, but it really is not a different kind of attention from disinterested attention. On the one hand, there are examples like the jealous husband watching Othello or the art collector who is happy about her investment. Dickie argues that these are really cases where the perceiver is not actually paying attention to the artwork. In the former case, the jealous husband is paying attention to the situation with his wife rather than the play. In the latter case, the art collector is paying attention to her finances, rather than the painting.

On the other hand, there are cases like the music student paying attention to chord progressions or a father watching his daughter at a piano recital. In these situations, Dickie argues, the music student and the father are paying attention to the artwork. There is no difference in their manner of attending or perceiving, despite perhaps a difference in motive. To sharpen this, the idea is that there is no special mode of perception that corresponds uniquely to the way we perceive when we adopt the aesthetic attitude. There is only one way to perceive or attend to something, and that is just by looking at it or noting features of it. The father, the music student, and the ideal aesthetic perceiver are all doing just that. The father and music student may be differently motivated, but this means nothing for the way in which they actually perceive or attend to the work.

The key to Dickie’s argument is that he takes Bullough and Stolnitz to understand the aesthetic attitude as involving a special kind of action or attention. From this, he argues that there is no special mode or manner of acting or attending that uniquely produces aesthetic experiences.

b. In Defense of Aesthetic Attitude Theories

As mentioned earlier, some responses to this have been offered. Gary Kemp offered an extended response to Dickie’s objections. Foremost among these is the denial of Dickie’s crucial premise that there is only really one way of acting or attending. Kemp argues that there are many different ways of attending. The music student may attend to the chord progressions, to the orchestration, or to the rhythms. Here, the student seems to be attending fully, but also in an interested way. But if he attends for the sake of enjoyment, then he is certainly attending differently and perhaps disinterestedly. These, Kemp says, are genuinely different ways of attending, and the real difficulty of the aesthetic attitude theory is to explain why some of them seem aesthetic and some do not. He then offers his own explanation of this distinction.

Kemp argues that disinterested attention does not seem to select the right cases. For example, it is intuitive that the father who attends his daughter’s recital could attend perfectly aesthetically to her performance, despite the fact that the reason he is there is to see his daughter. Kemp instead prefers Scruton’s notion of interest in the experience for its own sake. This supports examples like the father. Once he starts listening, he has a desire to go on listening to the music, we can imagine, and this desire does not now depend on any other desire to sustain it (although it came to exist only because he wanted to hear his daughter play). There is now no reason for his desire aside from his wanting to keep listening to the music.

c. Where to Go From Here

Aesthetic attitude theories have enjoyed isolated appearances in the past forty years, but the interest in it may be declining. Again, this may be due in part to the belief that Dickie’s criticisms were devastating and final, but it may also be due to the general dissatisfaction with the theoretical role the aesthetic attitude has been made to play. Many have moved to views of aesthetic experience, rather than aesthetic attitude, as the crucial notion to be considered. The differences between the two are subtle, but definite. Recall that the aesthetic attitude is a point of view one takes. It is, in a sense, a way of priming our experience in which we mentally set ourselves up to pay attention to certain things. The experiences that result, if we have been successful, are aesthetic experiences. These aesthetic experiences, in certain contemporary views, play the theoretical role that the aesthetic attitude was originally meant to play. Thus, philosophers have recently tried to draw the boundary between aesthetic and non-aesthetic objects using the notion of an aesthetic experience instead of the aesthetic attitude. The things that afford aesthetic experiences (or, alternatively, facilitate it) are aesthetic objects. These views can extend their theoretical reaches further in many ways. For example, they can offer a definition of artworks as the things that are created intentionally in order to afford aesthetic experiences. As such, these theories may have largely supplanted the original aesthetic attitude theories, since aesthetic experience can seem like a less presumptuous notion and more theoretically powerful. This move to aesthetic experience is most prominent in the work of Monroe Beardsley, but also to be found in Malcolm Budd, Kendall Walton, and many other contemporary thinkers. Whatever the fate of the aesthetic attitude theories and the aesthetic experience theories that follow them, the notion of a special kind of aesthetic attitude or experience remains, if not of central theoretical importance, of great interest in thinking about our aesthetic lives.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Beardsley, Monroe. 1982. The Aesthetic Point of View. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
    • A collection of Beardsley’s essays. For the turn to aesthetic experience, see especially the essay “The Aesthetic Point of View.”
  • Budd, Malcolm. 1995. Values of Art. London: Penguin Books.
    • Budd’s main work in aesthetics that addresses aesthetic value across different media.
  • Bullough, Edward. 1957. Aesthetics: Lectures and Essays, ed. Elizabeth M. Wilkinson. London: Bowes & Bowes.
    • A collection of Bullough’s essays that includes both “‘Psychical Distance’” and “The Modern Conception of Aesthetics.”
  • Bullough, Edward. 1912. “‘Psychical Distance’ as a Factor in Art and an Aesthetic Principle.” British Journal of Psychology 5, 87-118.
    • The classic article in which the notion of psychical distance first appears.
  • Burke, Edmund. 1958. A Philosophical Enquiry into the Origin of our Ideas of the Sublime and the Beautiful, ed. James T. Boulton. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Where Burke criticizes the faculty of taste and presents his own views of the beautiful and sublime.
  • Dickie, George. 1964. “The Myth of the Aesthetic Attitude.” American Philosophical Quarterly 1, 56-65.
    • The most famous objections to the aesthetic attitude theory.
  • Fenner, David. 1996. The Aesthetic Attitude. New Jersey: Humanities Press.
    • A thorough, historical overview of the issues. A great secondary resource.
  • Guyer, Paul. 1993. Kant and the Experience of Freedom: Essays on Aesthetics and Morality. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • A collection of essays about Kant’s aesthetics and the historical context surrounding it.
  • Hume, David. 1987. “Of the Standard of Taste.” In Eugene Miller (ed.), Essays: Moral, Political, and Literary (pp. 226-249). Indianapolis: Liberty Fund.
    • Hume explains how the faculty of taste develops and works.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1971. An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue. New York: Garland.
    • Hutcheson’s theory of the moral and aesthetic faculties.
  • Kant, Immanuel. 2000. Critique of the Power of Judgment, ed. Paul Guyer, trans. Paul Guyer and Eric Matthews. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Kant’s systematic treatment of aesthetics and teleology.
  • Kemp, Gary. 1999. “The Aesthetic Attitude.” British Journal of Aesthetics 39, 392-399.
    • A series of responses to Dickie’s objections, and a further analysis of aesthetic attitude theory.
  • Langfeld, Herbert Sidney. 1920. The Aesthetic Attitude. New York: Harcourt, Brace and Co.
    • An introduction to prominent theories of the time, mixed with Langfeld’s own views on the issues.
  • Schopenhauer, Arthur. 1969. The World as Will and Representation, Volume I, trans. Eric F. J. Payne. New York: Dover.
    • Schopenhauer’s magnum opus, in which he offers his theory of the world as developing Will and represented Ideas.
  • Scruton, Roger. 1982. Art and Imagination: A Study in the Philosophy of Mind. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • A theory of aesthetics developed on the basis of an empiricist philosophy of mind.
  • Shaftesbury, Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of. 1999. Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, ed. Lawrence E. Klein. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Shaftesbury’s views on a wide range of topics. For his aesthetic theory, see especially the section “The Moralists.”
  • Stolnitz, Jerome. 1960. Aesthetics and Philosophy of Art Criticism. Cambridge: Riverside Press.
    • A topic-based introduction to aesthetics, mixed with Stolnitz’s own views on the issues.


Author Information

Alexandra King
Brown University
U. S. A.


Modal Metaphysics

Modal metaphysics concerns the metaphysical underpinning of our modal statements. These are statements about what is possible or what is necessarily so. We can construe the primary question of modal metaphysics as, “When we make a statement about what is possible or necessary, what determines the truth or falsity of the statement?” As an illustration, consider the statement “It is possible for me to be a dentist.” This says that one possibility for me is to enter the dentistry profession. That seems true enough. But if so, what determines its truth? Normally, a statement is true because it represents a situation that actually obtains, but in the present case, the statement represents a situation which does not actually obtain. So, why is the statement true?

Some philosophers, such as W.V.O Quine, dismiss this question by rejecting the coherence of modal notions. More typically, though, metaphysicians will answer that modal statements are not evaluated by how things actually are, but rather by how things might be or must be. Following Saul Kripke (1959; 1963), modal facts are construed as facts about possible worlds, where the actual world is just one among the many worlds that are possible. Kripke’s modal logic first defines each possible world by a maximally consistent set of statements, a consistent set such that for any statement p, either p or ~p is a member. Once these worlds are defined, a statement with the normal form “Possibly, p” is said  [in the most elementary kind of Kripkean logic]  to be true if, and only if, there is at least one possible world in which the state-of-affairs p obtains. Similarly, “Necessarily, p” is true precisely when p obtains in every possible world. So, the sentence “It is possible for me to become a dentist” is true because there is at least one possible world, so defined, where I am a dentist. Note that the above concerns metaphysical possibilities, specifically. The article will not discuss epistemic possibilities.

The  Kripkean apparatus was a great advance in logic, but it did not resolve the distinctly metaphysical issue. If our question was roughly, “What determines the truth or falsity of modal statements?,” then Kripke’s logic just seems to replace this question with “What are these ‘possible worlds’ that determine their truth or falsity?” Yet due to the influence of Kripke’s system, the latter question is often the one pursued in the literature and not the former question. So, this article reviews five kinds of answer to the question about possible worlds: (1) Meinong's Realism, (2) David Lewis’ Realism, (3) Ersatzism, (4) Fictionalism, and (5) David Armstrong’s hybrid of (3) and (4). The last section considers Quine’s skepticism about the issue and about modality in general.

Table of Contents

  1. Meinong's Realism
  2. Lewis’ Realism
  3. Ersatzism
    1. Sententialism
    2. Propositionalism and Property Ersatzism
    3. Pictorial Ersatzism
    4. Combinatorialism
    5. Non-Reductivism
  4. Fictionalism
  5. Armstrong’s Hybrid
  6. Quine's Skepticism
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Meinong's Realism

Meinong's Realism, also called Meinongian Realism, is the contemporary Meinongian view which starts with Kripke’s possible worlds and attempts to make metaphysical sense of non-actual worlds and their denizens. The label ‘Meinongian,’ however, is anachronistic since Alexius Meinong was writing years before the advent of Kripkean worlds. Yet Meinong’s view of non-actual objects is one position to take regarding non-actual worlds. And indeed, the most important figure in modal metaphysics—David Lewis—was initially construed as a Meinongian about these worlds (see, for example, Plantinga 1976, Lycan 1979). Though Lewis’ (1986) view is clearly not a Meinongian one, as we shall see in the next section.

According to the Meinongian, it is intuitively evident that there are non-existent objects, such as Pegasus, unicorns, and the like. Even impossible objects, such as round squares, are counted among the things that there are. Infamously, Meinong once expressed this in the slogan “there are objects such that it is true to say of them that there are no such objects” (1904, p. 83). Despite the air of paradox, however, the idea that non-existent objects somehow “exist” can claim several advantages. For one, it is eminently faithful to ordinary language use, where apparently speakers refer freely to non-existents. For another, the view naturally extends the commonsense semantics of ordinary names to empty names such as ‘Pegasus.’ Unlike the descriptivist, say, the Meinongian simply regards ‘Pegasus’ labeling an object (albeit a non-existing one), just in the way that people commonly regard ‘Tony Blair’ as a label for a person. And besides this straightforward linguistic account, the Meinongian view also delivers objects to thoughts which might otherwise seem void. Thus, the Meinongian can say (for example) that physicists who hypothesized Vulcan were not literally thinking of no object; rather, they were thinking of a bona fide object, albeit a non-existent one.

Yet the reader may already sense one urgent objection for Meinongianism, namely, that it just dresses up something contradictory. On this line, once all the obfuscation is cleared away, Meinong is committed to the absurdity that non-existents exist. Meinong, however, anticipated this reaction and suggested that his intent was not to place non-existent objects in the categories of both being and non-being. Rather, they are to be placed in neither category, and instead lie “beyond being and non-being” (op. cit., p. 86).

Alternatively, some Meinongians respond to the charge by distinguishing two kinds of being, that is to say, the usual kind of being, and the sort of the “being” that Pegasus has (with scare quotes). This would allow us to reconstrue Meinong’s slogan as the claim that “there are” objects of which it is true to say that there are no such objects. However, these Meinongians often do not provide much explication of “being” in the scare-quoted sense, and critics have thus doubted its intelligibility.

Relatedly, there is Russell’s objection that Meinong’s commitment to the existence of round squares lands in contradiction.  In “On Denoting,” Russell generally objects to Meinong’s lack of a “robust sense of reality;” however, Russell regards  impossibilia (that is, objects which are neither actual nor possible) as especially problematic. Nonetheless, our concern here is with possibilia only, and Meinong’s view of impossibilia can be bracketted,

Regardless, even if the Meinongian view is intelligible, it faces additional difficulties. For instance, it appears Occam’s Razor would have us shave off Meinongian objects from our ontology (Quine 1948). A second concern is that some Meinongian objects seem incomplete or gappy. For instance, does Sherlock Holmes have a mole on his left knee? Even though “there is” such a person, Meinongianism apparently does not determine a fact of the matter. (Though again, a Meinongian view of possibilia, specifically, might just reject incomplete objects.) Quine protested that Meinongian objects have no clear individuation-conditions. Imagine first a non-existent bald man in a doorway, and then imagine a non-existent fat man in the doorway. Now ask yourself: Have you imagined the same man or not? The Meinongian seems to lack the resources to determine a fact of the matter.

2. Lewis’ Realism

The Meinongian view could be seen as Realist view about possible objects, since it holds that all possible objects (possibilia) are “real” in an important sense. A more robust kind of Realism, however, is expounded by David Lewis (1969; 1973; 1986). Unlike Meinongians who identify different kinds of “being” (or a realm “beyond being and non-being”), Lewis makes clear that there is only one kind of being, and that all possibilia (that is, all actual and non-actual possible objects) have it. Thus Lewis’ provocatively suggests that non-actual possibles exist in just the same way that you and I do (1986, pp. 2-3) Despite the prima facie implausibility, however, there is a type of indispensability argument which may speak in favor of the view. The idea is that talk of “possible worlds” is too useful to modal semantics to see it as a mere façon de parler (way of speaking). In the hard sciences, moreover, if an unobservable entity is theoretically useful, that is often seen as a reason to think it exists. In like manner, says Lewis, the theoretical utility of possible worlds provides at least some reason to believe that these objects exist (in the only sense of ‘exist’ that there is).

Now even if we are inclined to posit possibilia, it may seem that Lewis goes too far in declaring that possible worlds exist “in just the same way” that you and I do. After all, you and I are actual whereas Pegasus and his world are not. However, it is crucial that when Lewis calls a possible object “actual,” he is not attributing it any ontological status beyond the fact that it exists. For when Lewis says we are “actual” (and Pegasus is not), he only means that we are actual relative to this world. In contrast, relative to a world of Greek mythology, he will say it is Pegasus who is actual and we who are not. This should not suggest that there is a special property of “actuality” that is being passed around. Rather, it illustrates that Lewis uses ‘actual’ as an indexical term vis-à-vis worlds: Just as the pronoun ‘I’ picks out different people on different occasions (depending on the speaker), ‘actual’ can denote the objects of different worlds, depending on which world is relevant. Accordingly, Lewis’ use of ‘actual’ only serves to locate an object in the world of concern, among the myriad of worlds that exist. But consequently, there is no non-relative sense in which we (but not Pegasus) are “actual.”

So again, anything possible exists (in the only sense of ‘exists’ that there is); nonetheless, some objects are also actual though this merely serves to locate them in a contextually relevant world. But this talk of “locating” should not suggest that possible worlds exist in a shared space, where each world has a “location” in that space. For Lewis denies that spatio-temporal relations hold between worlds. Worlds are spatio-temporally isolated on his view; we cannot speak of events occurring at the same time in different worlds, nor can we speak of distances between worlds. As a corollary, there cannot be causal relations between worlds either (assuming causes bear some temporal relation to their effects). So oddly, even though alternate worlds exist just as much as we do, they do not exist anywhere in relation to us.

This could mislead, however, in suggesting that Lewisian worlds are a type of abstract object, akin to universals or sets. Realists about abstracta sometimes say that their objects lack a location, despite the fact they exist. However, Lewis concedes at least three senses in which his worlds qualify as “concrete.” First, note that if sets and universals are counted as abstract, then a contrast can be with individuals or particulars. In that case, Lewisian worlds qualify as non-abstract or “concrete,” since they are particulars. (But, note that a concrete world can be home to abstract objects all the same.) Second, the abstract/concrete distinction sometimes concerns whether an object has spatio-temporal dimensions. Yet here too, since Lewis’ worlds are spatio-temporal kinds of entities, they qualify as “concrete.” Finally, Lewis recognizes that some things might be abstract in the sense of being an “abstraction,” that is, they might be the kind of entity represented by an incomplete or gappy description. (An example would be “the Average American”). In line with Kripke, however, Lewis accepts that each possible world is described by the sentences in some maximally consistent set—and the set would describe the world completely. So worlds are concrete by this criterion also.

However, in talking of maximally consistent sets, Lewis would seem to utilize the modal notion of “consistency.” Note that consistency is indeed modal; a set of sentences is consistent if and only if it is possible for those sentences to be jointly true. So at first, it may seem that Lewis’ theory simply helps itself to one of the modal notions it was supposed to account for. But this is misleading. Although Lewis accepts Kripke’s way of characterizing worlds, it is ultimately unnecessary to his metaphysics. Since Lewis’ worlds genuinely exist, he can say instead that worlds are non-gappy by simply appealing to the non-gappy facts of such worlds.

Not only is each world “gapless,” he also thinks there is no gap in the collective of worlds. That is to say, absolutely every way that a world could possibly be is the way that some world is. But oddly, this last statement looks truistic given Lewis’ Realism. For if robust facts about worlds determine what is possible, then trivially the worlds exhaust the possibilities—even if there are only 17 worlds or 1 (or even none)! To secure the “plentitude” of worlds, then, Lewis makes use of a certain Recombination Principle. In its most basic form, this principle states that any object can co-exist with any other object. However, Lewis eventually revises this in considering two objects from different worlds. Objects from different worlds cannot co-exist, since Lewis presumes that worlds cannot “overlap” in any way. So in the end, Lewis achieves the plentitude of worlds with a modified Recombination Principle; this says that if x ¹ y, then in some possible world, x or a duplicate of x co-exists with y or a duplicate of y (assuming the spacetime of some world is large enough to contain the two).

Lewis’ “no overlap” intuition brings us to an important feature of his modal metaphysics. Consider that, according to this intuition, you are part of the actual world and only the actual world. There is no sense in which you inhabit some genuinely existing alternative universe. Nonetheless, if we follow Kripke’s logic to the letter, the statement “It is possible for me to be a dentist” is true (if uttered by you), in virtue of some alternate world where you yourself exist and are a dentist. Occupying more than one world may be fine as concerns pure logic, but when taken as a metaphysical thesis, Lewis finds it intolerable. So in the end, he denies that in alternate worlds, you make true the modal statements about you.

But if not you, who else could do this job? Lewis (1973) responds with the idea of a counterpart: Even though you only occupy the actual world, you have counterparts in other possible worlds that determine the truth of ‘It is possible for me to be a dentist.' In general, a counterpart will be a non-actual object that is “sufficiently similar” to you in certain worlds. But when is an object “sufficiently similar?”  Lewis in fact thinks there are no absolute conditions on this. In some contexts ‘It is possible for me to be a dentist’ (uttered by you) is true in virtue of a non-actual dentist that, say, merely looks like you. Whereas in other contexts, perhaps the only thing that will do is a dentist who is a strict molecule-for-molecule duplicate of you.

Counterpart theory, even independent of Lewisian Realism, has several objections to reckon with. For instance, simply as a logical point, it has the strange consequence that “Necessarily, I am myself” is true only in virtue of objects that are neither identical to me nor to one another. (Technical aside: Lewis thinks there is nothing strange here if we think of a counterpart as a “deferred referent.”) Regardless, let us now turn to criticisms of Lewis’ Realism itself.

As Lewis is aware, the most glaring issue is that the view just ignores the Principle of Parsimony, which demands that entities should not be multiplied beyond necessity. According to this objection, the uncountable worlds that Lewis’ posits are just ontologically gratuitous, akin to Ptolemy’s epicycles-upon-epicycles for the planetary orbits. Lewis (1973), however, distinguishes so-called quantitative parsimony from qualitative parsimony. He grants that his Realism may well violate quantitative parsimony, given the number of entities in his ontology, yet he suggests it is only qualitative parsimony that really matters. The latter just concerns the number of kinds that a theory acknowledges, rather than the raw number of entities themselves—and Lewis claims his Realism is indeed qualitatively parsimonious. After all, we already believe in the actual world, and Lewis is merely asking us to believe in more entities of that kind. In contrast, Meinongian Realism increases the kinds that entities exist. For Meinongian objects have “being” in a different kind of way than ordinary objects (or worse, they belong to a sui generis kind that lies “beyond being and non-being”).

A different issue that Lewis acknowledges concerns the epistemology of worlds. It is natural to think that causal interaction with x is required in order to know about x, as when the senses causally interact with the world. Yet for Lewis, there is no causal interaction between us and other worlds, and so knowledge of other worlds looks problematic. (The issue here is analogous to Benacerraf’s dilemma for Mathematical Realism.)

Lewis’ solution here is to say that knowledge of non-actual worlds does not require causal interaction. But if not, how do we acquire modal knowledge? His reply is that for the most part, our modal knowledge follows from our (tacit) knowledge of the Recombination Principle. Though typically, we do not strictly derive modal truths from the Principle; instead, we imagine some state-of-affairs and “test” it against the Principle. Yet even if we grant all this, Lewis may need to explain further how we know that this Principle accords precisely with the real modal facts.

Further worries about Lewis’ view concern the individuation of worlds. He contends that a continuous region of space-time is necessary and sufficient to individuate a world. More exactly, objects constitute a possible world just in case all the parts of the objects bear spatio-temporal relations to each other. (When they do, the objects are called “worldmates.”)  This, in conjunction with the spatio-temporal isolation of worlds, blocks the consequence that all possible worlds form one Big Possible World. Yet in this, Lewis is forced to say that no possible world contains isolated space-time regions. And as Lewis admits, it is counter-intuitive to say that. Still, he claims that such a possibility is “no central part of our modal thinking,” so he prefers to bite the bullet instead of rejecting his definitions of ‘worldmate’ and ‘world’ (1986, p. 71).

Another important critique of Lewis, expressed by Plantinga (1987), runs as follows. Suppose that physicists really did discover uncountably many alternative universes, each different from the others. Why, asks Plantinga, would we suppose that these have anything to do with modality? After all, intuitively, what is possible for me does not depend on facts about any “maximal objects” that exist; it is not as if facts about these spatiotemporally removed objects are what make it possible for me to be a dentist. Yet it is unclear how much force the point has; Lewis might reply that Plantinga’s “intuition” on this is merely a bias against his view.

Here is one further issue for Lewis’ account. One of its biggest advantages is supposedly that it avoids circularity—that is, it does not explicate our modal notions by utilizing a modal notion. (In contrast, circularity is a recurring problem for Lewis’ competitors, as we shall see.) However, Lycan (1994) has objected that Lewis’ analysis indeed employs a modal notion. Namely, ‘world’ in Lewis’ mouth means possible world, in contrast to the impossible worlds whose existence Lewis rejects. To be sure, if Lewis’ possible worlds genuinely exist, the facts about those worlds might metaphysically determine the modal facts unproblematically. But the issue is whether Lewis’ theory understands modal talk in completely nonmodal terms. Lycan’s point is that it does not, given that the theory rests on the distinction between “possible” and “impossible” worlds.

If Lewis were to surrender this distinction, so that ‘world’ denotes any kind of world whatsover, then ‘world’ could be a nonmodal term in Lewis’ primitive vocabulary. Indeed, many have said that Lewis should admit impossible worlds anyway, for the same kind of indispensability reasons in favor of possible worlds. (Impossible worlds facilitate the semantics of, for example, “Some round squares are round” or “Crazy people believe that some round squares exist.”) However, Lewis resists impossibilia, since he takes it as axiomatic that we can never assert a truth about an object by uttering a contradiction. Yet if Lewis’ worlds do not include impossible worlds, then his use of ‘world’ may indeed express a modal notion, meaning that circularity would again be a worry.

There is one final objection to Lewis we should note. Suppose for the sake of argument that Lewis has adequately answered the objections raised thus far. Still, the claim that the plentitude of worlds genuinely exists seems ridiculously, outrageously implausible by commonsense standards. This kind of reaction is what Lewis calls “The Incredulous Stare.” Lewis acknowledges that his view violates commonsense, even “to an extreme extent,” and that this is a liability for the theory. Nevertheless, he emphasizes that commonsense is not the final arbiter on what is philosophically best, and that the theoretical advantages of his Realism ultimately outweigh the disadvantages. Though, as he grants, this may be somewhat open to debate.

3. Ersatzism

We now come to the primary alternative to Modal Realism, the Ersatz approach. Most basically, the Ersatzer construes talk about a possible world as talk about some ersatz object. (‘Ersatz’ is German for ‘replacement’ or ‘substitute.') Thus the truth or falsity of a modal statement is explained by appeal to surrogates or proxies for possible worlds, rather than to genuinely existing worlds themselves. Thus, “It is possible for me to be a dentist” is true not because of a concretely existing alternate world, but rather because there is some ersatz world, according to which I am a dentist.

Different writers take different entities as their ersatz worlds, but the common idea is to use objects that are just plain actual, thus avoiding a Realist commitment to non-actuals. Yet to be clear, even though ersatz worlds are all actual, only one is actualized. This indicates another shared feature of worlds among Ersatzers; a world-surrogate is in some sense representational. After all, besides implying that some ersatz world “corresponds” to our world, the Ersatzers generally speak of what is true “according to a world.” Nevertheless, Ersatzers diverge on which actual representational objects should be the world-surrogate. The abstract objects recruited for this purpose include (a) sets of sentences, (b) sets of propositions or properties/relations, (c) pictorial objects, (d) combinations of matter and empty space (defined set-theoretically), and (e) objects that lack any specification beyond “abstract.” Let us review these options in turn.

a. Sententialism



One of the first Ersatz views was Rudolf Carnap’s (1947) Sententialism, where maximally consistent sets of sentences took the place of possible worlds. Writing before Kripke, however, Carnap did not speak of these sets as “ersatze” for worlds. He just utilized the sets as they were, referring to them as “state descriptions.” Still, posterior to Kripke’s modal logic, one might naturally assimilate state descriptions to ersatz worlds, since state descriptions fulfill the semantic role that is otherwise played by worlds.

According to Sententialism, then, truth or falsity of a sentence “Possibly, p” is ultimately a matter of whether some maximally consistent set contains the sentence “p” as a member. In similar fashion, “Necessarily, p” is true or false depending on whether all such sets contain “p.” Naturally, such a view requires an ontological commitment to sets, but such abstract objects might be required anyway (perhaps due to Quine-Putnam indispensability arguments). And a commitment to sets and the like may not seem quite as objectionable as a Realist’s commitment to nonactual objects.

Still, there are other issues. For one, the sets cannot just contain sentence-tokens (individual sentences that have actually been spoken or uttered), since there have only been finitely many tokens in the history of the world. (In contrast, every maximally consistent set patently contains infinitely many sentences.) Charitably speaking, then, Sententialism instead holds that ersatz worlds are sets of linguistic (or possibly mental) sentence-types. (Though, note, Lewis thinks that there are still cardinality problems unless the sentences are “Lagadonian,” where objects themselves are used as their own names). And so besides sets, the Ersatzer now may incur an ontological commitment to a further kind of abstract object, “types.”

Finally, the Sententialist faces a circularity worry. In utilizing maximally consistent sets, the Sententialist account depends on the modal notion of “consistency.” And unlike Lewis, the Sententialist cannot try to eliminate this notion by instead depending on robust facts about concrete possible worlds. So the Sententialist apparently takes as given one of the notions it wants to explicate.

b. Propositionalism and Property Ersatzism

It is notable that similar worries persist if the Ersatzer opts instead for maximally consistent sets of propositions, as in Plantinga (1972) and Adams (1974). This is obvious enough if propositions are identified with linguistic (or mental) sentence-types. And if propositions are construed as a different kind of abstract object, the number of ontological commitments seems to increase unnecessarily. Nonetheless, the Ersatzer might insist that the ontological cost here is not as high as it is with Lewisian worlds. (Though the problem remains that the Ersatzer apparently presupposes a modal notion of “consistency”)

Typically, a proposition is a complex of objects and properties/relations (or representations thereof). For instance, the proposition that I am a dentist would often be seen as composed of (representations of) myself and the property of being a dentist. But as noted in Lycan (1994), an Ersatzer can instead follow Parsons (1980), who individuates objects in terms of properties. (Unlike Parsons, however, the Ersatzer would regard the property-bundles as actual abstracta rather than Meinongian nonexistents.) In more detail, the Property Ersatzer identifies objects with bundles of properties (intuitively, the properties that the object has). And from these, worlds are built by describing relations between the property-groupings. One advantage of such an Ersatzism is that the property-groupings and their interrelations are all stipulated, meaning that unlike Lewis, the Ersatzer need not explain how knowledge of spatiotemporally isolated, concrete worlds is possible. Though again, the property-groupings must be “consistent,” meaning that circularity may be an issue here as well.

In fact, Property Ersatzers as well as Propositionalists have even more circularity worries when it comes to the metaphysics of the propositions or properties themselves. Many times, a proposition is defined by a set of possible worlds (intuitively, the worlds where the proposition is true)—whereas a property is often defined by a set of possible objects (intuitively, the objects that have the property in question). But both accounts depend on the notion of “possibility”, so they apparently cannot underwrite the Ersatzer’s propositions or properties, on pain of circularity.

Lewis gives two further objections to these Ersatz views. One is that if ersatz worlds are defined via properties, then it will be impossible to have distinct yet indiscernible objects. After all, for this Ersatzer, possible objects are individuated only by their properties—so if x and y are objects that have exactly the same properties, it would follow on this view that x = y. In addition, Lewis holds that such Ersatz accounts cannot allow other “alien” (that is, non-actual) properties, even though such properties seem possible. The intuition is that there might have been other properties than the properties we encounter in the actual world. But Property Ersatzers seem unable to accommodate this intuition. For they wish to limit themselves to actual abstracta when building the ersatz world. And that means non-actual abstracta, which would include non-actual properties, would not characterize any ersatz world.

Nevertheless, one could reply in typical Ersatz fashion that all properties, including alien properties, are actual abstract objects—it’s just that the alien properties are not actualized. Even so, Lewis replies that the Ersatzer should still provide individuation-conditions for alien properties. (Otherwise, the view would not secure the possibility of two objects differing only in alien properties.) But, says Lewis, since the Ersatzer denies the existence of alien properties, their individuation-conditions would presumably be supplied by some general theory of properties. Yet as we saw, the standard theory of properties would only create circularity in the Ersatzer’s account.

c. Pictorial Ersatzism

However, perhaps an Ersatzer can accommodate the possibility of alien properties in a different way. On this, Lewis considers a “Pictorial Ersatzer,” an Ersatzer who holds that all possible properties (including alien properties) are actually instantiated on abstract pictures. But to understand this properly, some further set-up is needed.

In general, the pictorial objects would act as ersatz worlds, representing the possible ways the world might be. Lewis suggests that the pictures would be representative, specifically, by isomorphism, by a mirroring between parts of the picture and parts of what is represented.  Strictly speaking, however, “isomorphism” is achieved by parts of the picture instantiating the very same properties and relations instantiated by the objects. Thus, a splotch of the picture would be isomorphic to the cat by having the very same shape and the very same color as the cat.

But of course, real pictures do not represent by such strict isomorphism. Yet the reason an oil paining can still represent a cat is because there are various conventions in place for us to associate cat-esque parts of the painting with real cats. Lewis thinks, however, that if Pictorial Ersatzism is meant to be a genuine alternative to Sententialism, such conventional elements must be absent from the pictorial ersatz worlds. Thus, Lewis proposes that these abstract pictorial objects should be idealized pictures which represent by a complete isomorphism (in as much as this is possible).

When it comes to alien properties, however, this idealization would prove helpful. The Ersatzer would hold that the alien properties are actually instantiated by abstract pictures (though they remain “alien” in being uninstantiated concretely.) And in brief, Lewis thinks this might allow the Ersatzer to individuate the alien properties. If so, then unlike the Property Ersatzer, the Pictorial Ersatzer could meet Lewis’ demand to individuate alien properties. She would do so, moreover, without invoking the standard general theory of properties (which, recall, would create circularity).

Regardless, Lewis identifies (at least) three difficulties for Pictorial Ersatzism. One is that the view presupposes rather than explicates the notion of “possible,” since the isomorphisms are each understood to hold between a picture and a possible scenario. Another is that the isomorphisms would fail, since an abstract ersatz cat is not a cat—an abstract object is not the sort of thing that can instantiate felinehood. Finally, it is dubious whether an ontological commitment to these world-pictures is better than a commitment to concrete worlds. For although every Ersatzer is committed to abstract objects, the Pictorial Ersatzer’s objects are not “abstract” in the usual senses of the term. Most notably, an abstract object is prototypically one that does not enter into spatio-temporal relations. Yet the isomorphism between the picture of the cat on the mat required a certain spatial arrangement of the parts. (Note that there are other ways to construe ‘abstract,’ but Lewis finds these no better.)

d. Combinatorialism

Combinatorialism is yet another view which prefers abstract surrogates over concrete possible worlds. The view has roots in the Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, but interestingly it was Quine, our modal skeptic, who first developed it in some detail. Yet it was Creswell 1972 who first accepted and defended the view. According to the Combinatorialist, an ersatz world is roughly a set-theoretic construction of some distribution of matter throughout a space-time region. As an illustration, a Combinatorialist might start with a co-ordinate system in a four-dimensional Newtonian spacetime, and identify the position of each space-time point in the usual manner, using numerical values along the x-axis, the y-axis, and the z-axis. Next, we can assign a time t to each point, so that the spatial-temporal location of a point is completely defined by an ordered quadruple <x, y, z, t>. Finally, for each point in the co-ordinate system, we stipulate that the point either is filled with matter or is empty space, by assigning it the number 1 or 0, respectively. The result then represents a four-dimensional space-time where matter is distributed according to the 1s and 0s.  (Technical addendum: Since a space can be mapped by more than one co-ordinate system, a world is ultimately defined by an equivalence class of such systems.)

The example of course utilizes a Newtonian spacetime, but a Combinatorialist can identify other space-times, describe them by co-ordinate systems, and assign 1s and 0s as before. Regardless, there is always the chance that some possible space-time remains unidentified, leaving the combinatorial possibilities incomplete. Moreover, as Lewis highlights, our modal intuitions can be infirm about whether certain space-times are possible. For instance, is it possible to have entities which are temporally but not spatially located? In contrast, Lewis believes he has no need to answer this since he can just let the concrete modal facts fall where they may.

As might be expected, circularity is also a worry for this brand of Ersatzism. Perhaps the best way to levy the charge is by considering how a distribution of simples relates to macro states-of-affairs. In the first instance, the set-theoretic constructions determine the position of a world’s mereological atoms (that is, indivisible parts making up a whole), yet the assumption is that this also determines all the goings-on in the world at the macro-level. But in what sense “determines?” This would seem to concern the micro-facts metaphysically necessitating the macro-facts in a world. Yet metaphysical necessitation is of course a modal notion. So as before, it appears the Ersatzer has a circular analysis on her hands.

On a different note, the Combinatorialist should be concerned that her worlds only contain matter. After all, this implies that materialism is necessarily true—even though spiritual entities like Cartesian souls would seem to be at least possible. Now the Combinatorialist may simply bite the bullet here; after all, the fact that people believe in spiritual entities does not show their possibility (although, if propositions are sets of worlds, then it is harder to characterize those beliefs without worlds containing such entities). Or, a Combinatorialist might instead propose a kind of “neutral monism” whereby arrangements of atoms can result in either material or immaterial objects. Admittedly, however, it is hard to see how immaterial objects could be composed of “atoms,” much less the same type of “atoms” as material objects.

There is a further concern about the metaphysics of the atoms. Since the Combinatorialists wants to avoid non-actual objects, it seems her set-theoretic constructions must include only actual atoms. This is unfortunate, however, since limiting ourselves to actual matter rules out possible worlds with more matter than in our world, as well as worlds with different matter.

Nevertheless, a Combinatorialist may try to avoid both this problem and the problem about immaterial possibilia by recruiting (say) numbers as substitutes for non-actual substances. Yet it is unclear whether this is satisfactory, since numbers do not literally represent anything (much less represent nonactual matter); hence, the numbers will apparently be chosen arbitrarily. Consequently, once we have a set-theoretic construction using these numbers, we may be strained to believe that this specific construction really is what determines the truth of our modal statements. For why should this particular construction earn this status, over a structurally identical one that uses different numbers?

e. Non-Reductivism

A rather different approach is that of Stalnaker (1984) and (on one reading) Plantinga (1972). As in other Ersatz views, concrete possible worlds are replaced with actual abstract objects. But these ersatz worlds are simply identified as “maximal states-of-affairs” or “ways the world might have been” without further analysis in terms of sentences, propositions, universals, or anything else. Non-Reductionist Ersatzism may very well have some appeal, especially in light of the perceived failures of other Ersatz accounts, though talk of “maximal” states-of-affairs alone may be enough to make the account circular.

Note that even if the ersatz worlds are ontologically basic, they can nonetheless have structure. In line with Kripke’s logic, the Non-Reductivist can say that her worlds consist of states-of-affairs, which in turn are comprised of individuals and their properties/relations. Interestingly, Plantinga includes individual essences as well, sometimes called “hacceities”; such a thing is possessed by an individual necessarily, and is necessarily unique to the individual.

But at the most basic level, the Non-Reductivist simply interprets Kripke’s logic with respect to a domain of abstract objects, which are not analyzed in terms of anything more ontologically fundamental. Lewis thus calls the view “non-descript” Ersatzism, complaining that the theory is not much of a theory at all. (Lewis levies this criticism against a view he calls “Magical Ersatzism,” where ersatz worlds are structureless, mereological atoms. But he thinks the point carries over.) In fact, since Non-Reductivism is simply silent on reductive matters, it thus seems compatible with any of the reductions given by other Ersatzers. Lewis even suggests it compatible with reducing possible states-of-affairs to sets of Lewisian concrete worlds (if the sets are actual abstracta).

The Non-Reductivist can respond, however, by explicitly denying such reductions. But in that case, her ersatz worlds start to look like abstract objects that cannot be given any further reduction. Yet this would not put her at a disadvantage, says the Non-Reductivist, since Lewis’ Realism apparently cannot reduce concrete possibilia into more basic facts either.

Still, Lewis thinks the Ersatzer owes us more about what makes the modal truths true, if not concrete facts. And apparently, the Non-Reductivist is simply taking as primitive the crucial explanatory notions like “states-of-affairs,” “properties,” and so forth. What’s more, recall that the ersatz worlds are supposed to be representational, since certain things are true “according to a world.” Yet Non-Reductivism just leaves this representational feature as mysterious. (In contrast, Sententialism can explain the representational nature of its ersatz worlds by the representational nature of sentences.)

4. Fictionalism

A later approach to come on the scene is the Fictionalist view of possibilia. Fictionalism proper was first developed by Gideon Rosen (1990), although Armstrong’s (1989) view is expressly Fictionalist in part, as we shall see in the next section. Notably, Rosen does not always identify himself as a Fictionalist, and similarly with Daniel Nolan (who is arguably the leading expert on Fictionalism in the early 21st century). Nonetheless, the Fictionalist strategy has garnered a lot of attention, since at the least, it may be no more problematic than the Ersatz views. Plus, it can be applied to other problematic objects besides possible worlds, “moral facts” for example.

As concerns possible worlds, the Fictionalist says that a statement about such worlds should be understood as analogous to a statement like “According to Arthur Conan Doyle’s stories, Sherlock Holmes lives at 221B Baker Street in London.” Note first that Holmes-statement is false if we leave off the clause “According to the…stories,” also known as the “story-prefix." After all, it’s not literally true that Sherlock Holmes lives in London. Yet when the story-prefix is added, the assertion is indeed literally true. For there literally are sentences in the Doyle stories which specify this as the location of Holmes’ home.

In an analogous manner, the Fictionalist suggests that “There is some possible world with a talking donkey” is false strictly speaking, since (with all due respect to David Lewis) there are no such worlds. Nonetheless, it is entirely true to say “According to Lewis’ theory, there is some possible world with a talking donkey.” Taking this as her cue, the Fictionalist says that for any modal statement p, the statement is true if and only if, according to Lewis’ view, p.

One advantage that Fictionalism has over Lewis’ Realism is that the view is not as apt to provoke the “Incredulous Stare” by ignoring commonsense. A second advantage is that the Fictionalist does not have the same troubles with the epistemology of worlds. Recall: Lewis’ difficulty was that we bear no causal relationships to non-actual worlds, meaning that our epistemic access to these worlds seems problematic. Lewis responded by explaining modal knowledge via “imaginative tests,” where we judge whether an imaginary scenario is possible using the Principle of Recombination. One complaint against Lewis, then, is that these tests provide knowledge of the concrete existing worlds only if we antecedently know that the Recombination Principle provides for exactly the possibilities found in those worlds. However, the Fictionalist does not face this problem. Since she denies the concrete existence of the worlds, she can hold that the “imaginative tests” are enough for modal knowledge. After all, on her view, what Lewis’ Recombination Principle says (in conjunction with the rest of Lewis’ view) wholly determines what is possible. And to know what Lewis’ theory says, one does not need knowledge of any correspondence with concretely existing worlds.

Yet Fictionalism of course is not without its problems. One is that in talking of stories such as the PWF (Possible World Fiction), the Fictionalist would seem committed to a certain kind of abstract object, namely, “stories.” Rosen nonetheless sees this commitment as less severe than the Lewisian commitment to worlds. However, if the Fictionalist accepts that the PWF exists as an abstract story, understood as a set of sentences, then it may not be entirely clear how her view differs from Sententialist Ersatzism.

A second difficulty is that, according to Lewis’ Realism, Modal Realism is necessarily true—that is, Modal Realism is true at every world. And the Fictionalist holds that the truth of “Necessarily, p” is determined by whether Lewis’ Realism says “Necessarily, p.” Hence, if Lewis’ Realism says that Realism is necessary, the Fictionalist is then committed to the truth of “Necessarily, Lewis’ Realism is true,” and thereby surrenders her Fictionalism in favor of Modal Realism.

However, it has been subsequently argued that Lewis’ (1969) Realism does not entail the necessity of the view. It is key that Lewis’ early version of Modal Realism holds that “‘There are x’ is true at a world iff x exists in that world,” that is, as a spatio-temporal part of that world. But if so, then ‘There are multiple worlds’ will be true in no possible world. For within the space-time of a world W, there will only be one world that exists as an (improper) part, namely W itself.

A separate obstacle for Fictionalism is that Lewis is agnostic on certain modal matters, for example, the possible sizes of space-time. Such agnosticism is no threat to Lewis’ own metaphysics, since real concrete facts will determine whichever space-times are possible. But how does Fictionalist fix the facts here? In such a case, a Fictionalist might say that it is literally false that, for example, there is a possible spacetime that houses uncountably many donkeys. After all, it is false to say “According to the PWF, there is a possible world containing uncountably many donkeys,” for Lewis never says if space-time could contain that many donkeys. Yet Rosen points out that, given Lewis’ silence, the contrary statement “no possible spacetime houses uncountably many donkeys” would also come out false. And so, contrary statements would have the same truth-value. Consequently, Rosen instead advises the Fictionalist to leave such statements without a truth-value.

Another glaring issue for the Fictionalist is to give an adequate semantics of her story-prefix.  A standard sort of semantics would say that a statement of the form “According to the PWF, p” means “In a possible world where the PWF is true, p.” Yet if the Fictionalist analyzes possible-worlds statements in terms of story-prefixed statements, she cannot also analyze the latter in terms of the former, on pain of circularity. Of course, one might forego the possible-worlds analysis of the story-prefix and give a Meinongian account instead. But the typical Fictionalist is aiming for a slim ontology. As a final option, then, the Fictionalist might simply take her story-prefix as primitive. Though as Rosen says, this is hard to stomach especially if the story-prefixed statements occasionally lack a truth-value (in accordance with Rosen’s advice above). Besides, says Rosen, story-prefixes seem to have a compound structure that should be analyzable into more basic terms.

On a related matter, the Fictionalist seems to face a dilemma. Since PWF is a fiction, the claims it makes are false—yet is the PWF contingently or necessarily false? It is natural to understand “According to PWF, p” as saying that “if PWF were true, then p would be true.” Yet if the PWF is necessarily false, then the antecedent of this conditional is necessarily false. And that means the conditional will be true, even if p is an impossible proposition. On the other horn of the dilemma, if PWF is contingently false, then Fictionalism is inadequate to explicate the truth of “the PWF is contingently false.” For the Fictionalist would construe this as entailing “According to the PWF, there is a possible world where the PWF is true.” And per the schema above, that is equivalent to the truism “If the PWF were true, then the truth of the PWF would be possible.” Yet this is not equivalent to the claim that the PWF might have been true, since the latter is entirely nontrivial.

Nolan raises yet another objection concerning the “artificiality” of fiction. It seems we can create fictional states-of-affairs at whim, but modal matters do not seem so arbitrary. It thus seems we need to specify which fiction is the “right” fiction for possible worlds. Yet what would make the PWF the “right” fiction? Since the Fictionalist is not a Realist, she cannot say that the right fiction is the one that corresponds to the real possible worlds. But then, what would “rightness” consist in?

Finally, the Fictionalist also faces a more general circularity worry. Even if we ignore cases where Lewis is agnostic, the PWF will have gaps since it does not explicitly list every modal statement. So it seems that for the Fictionalist, some modal truths are true because they are entailed by the PWF. Yet entailment is a modal notion; a conjunction of statements entails a statement just in case it is impossible for the conjunction to be true and the latter false. So once again, our analysis of possible worlds seems to use one of the modal notions it was supposed to explicate.

5. Armstrong’s Hybrid

David Armstrong offers us a different type of modal metaphysics which is Ersatzist in part, but also partly Fictionalist. Most basically, however, Armstrong wants a “Naturalist” metaphysics, a metaphysics where anything that exists (i) has a location in actual space-time, and also (ii) enters into causal relations. This is in opposition to the Ersatz views which seem only to swap Lewis’ worlds for other ontologically dubious entities, namely, actual yet non-locatable abstracta. The Naturalism that drives Armstrong’s project will thus result in several notable modifications to both the Ersatzist and Fictionalist aspects of his view.

In general, it is fair to say that Armstrong adopts the Combinatorialist strategy of using combinatorial possibilities as ersatz worlds. But in line with Naturalism, Armstrong rejects the abstract set-theoretic constructions which the typical Combinatorialist posits. Instead, a possible world is construed as an ungrouped plurality or “heap” of elements.

As a further departure from the usual Combinatorialism, Armstrong’s elements are not mereological simples (that is, indivisible parts)—rather, they are whole states-of-affairs (which may or may not involve simples). The reason is that Armstrong sees states-of-affairs as more ontologically basic than particulars and their properties/relations, since those have no existence apart from states-of-affairs. He grants, however, that we may consider particulars and properties/relations in abstraction from states-of-affairs. So in some epistemic sense, it is true that Armstrong recombines particulars and their properties/relations, similar to other Combinatorialists. But from the more relevant, ontological angle, Armstrong’s combinations have states-of-affairs as the combinatorial elements, since nothing is more ontologically fundamental than these.

Armstrong’s worlds thus exist as “heaps” of states-of-affairs. However, only one heap is actual, so it may seem that Armstrong needs to posit non-actuals anyway, against his Naturalism. Yet Armstrong believes this conflict is resolvable if we think of non-actual heaps as fictional objects akin to “ideal” scientific entities, for example, ideal gasses, frictionless planes, perfect vacuums, and so forth. For although ideal scientific entities seem to be fictitious, our tendency is nonetheless to view, for example, the ideal gas laws as literally true. That is, we do not see the ideal gas laws as simply “true in fiction” in the way that we regard “Sherlock Holmes lives at 221B Baker Street” as merely true in fiction. But if we view these laws as literally true, it that would mean the ideal entities literally enter into causal relations and occupy space-time. And if so, then such fictitious entities would meet the constraints imposed by Naturalism.

Of course, not everyone is happy with Armstrong’s picture. The most important objection is that Armstrong does not describe the metaphysics of his fictions, beyond comparing them to frictionless surfaces and perfect vacuums. And it is not clear what account he could give. Naturalism of course precludes a Meinongian view of such objects, but also, the standard counterfactual analysis of fiction would result in circularity. As with other Fictionalists, Armstrong could not analyze worlds using fiction, and also analyze fictional discourse using counterfactual worlds.

Another point of contention is the anti-essentialism which is part of Armstrong’s view. Many philosophers follow Kripke (1972) in holding that at least some individuals have essential properties, properties that they necessarily exhibit. (So for instance, Bertrand Russell is essentially a member of homo sapiens.) However, Armstrong puts no constraints on what properties a possible individual might instantiate. Consequently, the view entails that it is possible (say) for Bertrand Russell to be a poached egg—though the current philosophical trends at the beginning of the 21st century are against such a thing.

6. Quine's Skepticism

So far the views here have all assumed Realism about modal truths, even though most refuse Realism about possible worlds. That is, they all assume that a statement like “I might have been a dentist” can be literally true, even though what makes it true may be something other than a concretely existing alternative world. Yet the reader can verify that Lewis’ Realism, Ersatzism, Fictionalism, the Armstrong Hybrid, and Conventionalism face circularity worries; each seems to implicitly deploy a modal notion in the analysis of modal notions. But to W.V.O. Quine, this would hardly come as a surprise. Quine argues that such circularity is in fact ineliminable, and that our modal notions are therefore defective. If so, the implication seems to be an Anti-Realism about modal truth or that modal notions cannot be used in expressing legitimate truths.

Quine’s argument here is found in his “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (one of the most celebrated philosophical article of the twentieth century). In the main, the paper concerns whether the terms ‘analytic’ and ‘synthetic’ can be properly defined, even provided the stock examples of analytic statements, for example, ‘Bachelors are unmarried men.' Yet Quine’s investigation bears on modal terms as well, since he presumes that a statement would be analytic if and only if it is necessary. (Against the philosophical lore, Quine is aware that this is contentious; see Quine 1960, p. 66; see below as well.) The upshot is that, for Quine, if one could appropriately define ‘analytic’, this would bring us closer to understanding modal terms.

A traditional definition of analyticity (from Kant) is dismissed as metaphorical, since it simply says that in an analytic statement, the predicate is “contained” in the subject. A different suggestion is that analytic statements are either logical truths or “true by definition.” The latter kind of truth would be a statement with a predicate that is synonymous with the subject-term, where synonyms could be listed by dictionary definitions. But for Quine, this just pushes back the question onto “synonymy.” When do terms count as synonymous?

One of the main proposals here is that synonyms are terms that can replace each other in the statements they occur, without altering the truth-values of those statements. (Quotational contexts and propositional attitude reports will be exceptions, but they could be catalogued as such.) Yet Quine worries that ‘creature with a heart’ and ‘creature with a kidney’ might pass this substitutivity test, since they supposedly co-refer, despite being non-synonymous. But in fact, these phrases do not intersubstitute, in a sentence like “Necessarily, a creature with a heart is a creature with a heart.” For while this statement is true, it is false that “Necessarily, a creature with a heart is a creature with a kidney.”

However, Quine protests that our definition of synonymy cannot rest on the notion of necessity, for otherwise we will have gone in a small definitional circle. Recall that Quine presumes necessity would be definable in terms of analyticity, but the present suggestion ultimately explicates analyticity in terms of necessity (via the notion of synonymy). So at best, the result is a rather tight circle of definitions.

Regardless, if we are presently unable to define these notions adequately, it does not follow that we will never be able to. But this is partly why, at the end of “Two Dogmas,” Quine provides a very general picture of the relations between statements, where the analytic/synthetic distinction (and the necessary/possible distinction) apparently can have no application. The picture, known as the “web of belief,” is one which (in the first instance) jettisons the idea that an individual hypothesis can be confirmed or disconfirmed by experience. Instead, a statement must first be embedded in an entire network of statements. Without going into the details, however, a consequence of this confirmation holism is that a disconfirming experience can motivate a revision of any statement in the network. Hence, Quine thinks it could conceivably be rational to revise even logical truths such as the Law of Excluded Middle in light of experimental results from quantum physics. More generally, since experience may prompt any statement to be revised, Quine sees it as folly to speak of statements that are analytic or necessarily true—that is, true no matter what.

A number of objections have been raised against Quine. Kripke (1972) suggests that there is a tendency to conflate notions of analyticity, necessity, and the a priori. Yet these notions are clearly different: As Kripke says, analyticity is a semantic notion, necessity is a metaphysical notion, and the apriori is an epistemic one. Kripke then argues further that some necessities are aposteriori, such as ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’, (and as a lesser point, that some contingencies seem apriori, such as ‘I am here now’). However, charitably Quine recognizes that different concepts are in play here. (It would be odd for him to speak of a definitional circle if he thought only one concept was in play.)

Even so, Quine apparently assumes that these concepts are co-extensional, and Kripke’s aposteriori necessities would discredit that. Yet Quine could reply that his concern is mainly with analyticity and necessity, and not the apriori. (It is notable that ‘apriori’ only occurs once in “Two Dogmas of Empiricism,” and merely as a rhetorical flourish.) Thus if Quine merely assumes that the necessities = the analyticities, Kripke’s examples of aposteriori truths have no immediate relevance. Still, many assume that Kripke’s aposteriori necessities are also synthetic truths. And if that is so, then Quine is wrong to assume that all necessities would be analytic. (But note, since “aposteriori” and “synthetic” are different notions, it may remain a bit unclear why aposteriori necessities must be synthetic.)

As concerns the “web of belief,” Grice & Strawson (1956) argue that this picture does not in fact preclude an analytic/synthetic distinction. For it is possible to distinguish cases where we revise a statement’s truth-value, from cases where we revise a statement’s meaning. As a simple example, suppose you believe that all swans are white (along with suitable auxiliary hypotheses). Yet suppose you see a black swan while traveling in Australia. Then, Grice & Strawson would say that you could either revise your belief about swans, or you could revise what you mean by ‘swan.’ In the latter case, you might revise ‘swan’ to mean “white swan” specifically. And then it would seem that “All swans are white” is analytic, since it simply amounts to the logical truth that “All white swans are white.”

For Quine, however, reducing “All swans are white” to a logical truth does not show it to be analytic or necessary, since even logical truths are revisable (as quantum physics seems to illustrate). Still, Quine’s views are radically at odds with the current philosophical orthodoxies, and so many philosophers remain unconvinced. One clear sign of this is the recent revival of conventionalism. This is the view that truths about what is possible or what is necessary are determined by linguistic convention, rather than by possible worlds, ersatz worlds, or the like. Such a view states that, pace Quine, logical truths are necessarily true, since linguistic conventions (more or less) stipulate them to be such. In earlier work, Quine (1936) more directly attacks such “truth by convention;” the reader is referred to Sider (2003), section 4, for an introduction to this debate. But interestingly, the conventionalist and Quine apparently would agree that facts about concrete or ersatz worlds do not ground modal statements. So regardless of whether Quine or the conventionalist is right, the primary lesson of this section stands, namely, that metaphysical accounts of possible worlds might be mistaken not just in detail, but in their most basic assumptions.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D. (1989). A Combinatorial Theory of Possibility, Cambridge: Cambridge UP
    • Presents Armstrong’s hybrid of Combinatorialism and Fictionalism, putatively in line with Naturalist ontology.
  • Carnap, R. (1947). Meaning and Necessity, Chicago: U of Chicago Press.
    • Historically the first articulation of the Sententialist view.
  • Cresswell, M. J. (1972). “The World is Everything that is the Case,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, vol. 50, pp. 113.
    • The first defense of a Combinatorialist view akin to that of Quine (1968).
  • de Rosset, L. (2009a). Possible Worlds I: Modal Realism, Philosophy Compass, 4(6), 998-1008.
    • This, along with Part II below, provide a useful overview of the latest developments in the debate regarding Modal Realism vs. its competitors.
  • de Rosset, L. (2009b). Possible Worlds II:  Nonreductive Theories of Possible Worlds, Philosophy Compass, 4(6), 1009-1021.
  • Divers, J. (2002). Possible Worlds, London: Routledge.
    • An detailed introduction  to the dialectic between Modal Realists and Ersatzers.
  • Grice, H. P. & P. F. Strawson (1956). “In Defense of a Dogma,” Philosophical Review, vol. 65, pp. 141-158.
    • Contains some of the most important criticisms of Quine (1953).
  • Kripke, S.A. (1959). A Completeness Theorem in Modal Logic, Journal of Symbolic Logic, 24(1), pp. 1–14.
    • This is where it all started; it presents Kripke’s logic for modal statements.
  • Kripke, S.A.  (1972). “Naming and Necessity,” in Davidson, D. & Harman, G., (eds.) Semantics of Natural Language, Dordrecht: Reidel, 253-355 & 763-769.    Reprinted as Naming and Necessity, Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP, 1980.
    • Provides an extremely influential theory of names and their behavior in modal statements. Also, it is cited when accusing Quine of conflating analyticity, necessity, and the a priori.
  • Lewis, D. (1969). Convention: A Philosophical Study, Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP.
    • Contains Lewis’ first statement of his Realism, also includes a noteworthy preface by Quine.
  • Lewis, D. (1973). Counterfactuals, Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP.
    • Another articulation of Lewis’ Realism; this is also the main source for Lewis on counterparts.
  • Lewis, D. (1986). On the Plurality of Worlds, Cambridge, MA: Blackwell.
    • A sustained defense of Lewis’ Realism, and an attack on the alternative, Ersatz views. The most important primary source in modal metaphysics.
  • Lewis, D. (1999). Papers in Metaphysics and Epistemology, Cambridge: Cambridge UP.
    • Contains several relevant papers on modal metaphysics, including Lewis’ criticisms of Routley (a contemporary Meinongian) and of Armstrong.
  • Lycan, W. (1979). The Trouble with Possible Worlds, in Loux, M. (ed.), The Possible and the Actual, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, pp. 274-316.
    • Contains some historically important criticisms of Lewis’ Realism. Also sketches a Propositionalist/Property Ersatz view.
  • Lycan, W. (1994). Modality and Meaning, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
    • Chapter 1-4 revise and expand the material from Lycan (1979). The book is a highly effective overview and response to the literature on modal metaphysics. Deserves to be widely read.
  • Meinong, A. (1904). “The Theory of Objects,” in Realism and the Background of Phenomenology, trans. I. Levi, D. B. Terrell, and R. Chisholm. Free Press, 1960.
    • Contains the slogan “There are objects of which it is true to say that there are no such objects.” One of the few pieces by Meinong widely available in English.
  • Melia, J. (2003). Modality, Montreal: McGill-Queen’s University Press.
    • An excellent introduction to many of the issues presented in this article.
  • Nolan, D. (2002). Topics in the Philosophy of Possible Worlds, New York: Routledge.
    • Nolan’s dissertation, contains several useful reflections on Fictionalism.
  • Plantinga, A. (1974) The Nature of Necessity, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Plantinga’s magnum opus on modality. Highlights include the discussion of counterpart theory and trans-world identity in Chapter 6, and the treatment of fictional objects in Chapter 8. Also, Plantinga’s modal version of Anselm’s ontological argument is not to be missed (Chapter 10).
  • Plantinga, A. (2003). Essays on the Metaphysics of Modality, M. Davidson (ed.), Oxford: Oxford UP.
    • A handy collection of Plantinga’s work in the area, including Chapter 8 of Plantinga (1974). It also has Plantinga’s (1972) modal metaphysics, as well as his (1987) relevance objection to Lewis’ Realism.
  • Quine, W. V. (1936). Truth by Convention, Reprinted in The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays, Revised edition, Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP, (1976), pp. 77-106.
    • Contains Quine’s best-known critique of the idea of “truth by convention.”
  • Quine, W.V. (1953). Two Dogmas of Empiricism, Reprinted in From a Logical Point of View, 2nd edition (pp. 20-46). Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP.
    • Presents Quine’s arguments against the analytic/synthetic distinction, and the necessary/possible distinction. Required reading for any student of philosophy.
  • Quine, W.V. (1968). “Propositional Objects,” in Ontological Relativity and Other Essays, Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP, (pp. 139-160)
    • Provides the first developed version of Combinatorialism, though Quine ultimately rejects the view.
  • Rosen, G. (1990). Modal Fictionalism, Mind 99 (395), pp. 327-354.
    • The first place where Fictionalism is developed in detail, as a modal metaphysics in its own right.
  • Sider, T. (2003). Reductive Theories of Modality, in Loux & Zimmerman (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Metaphysics, New York: Oxford UP, pp. 180-208.
    • Section 4 is a very useful introduction to conventionalism about modality; other sections are helpful as well regarding Modal Realism, Fictionalism, and the various Ersatzisms.
  • Stalnaker, R. (1984). Inquiry, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Presents a Non-Reductivist metaphysics, the last chapter is explicitly devoted to comparing Non-Reductivism to Reductivism.


Author Information

Ted Parent
Virginia Polytechnic Institute and State University
U. S. A.

The Hard Problem of Consciousness

The hard problem of consciousness is the problem of explaining why any physical state is conscious rather than nonconscious.  It is the problem of explaining why there is “something it is like” for a subject in conscious experience, why conscious mental states “light up” and directly appear to the subject.  The usual methods of science involve explanation of functional, dynamical, and structural properties—explanation of what a thing does, how it changes over time, and how it is put together.  But even after we have explained the functional, dynamical, and structural properties of the conscious mind, we can still meaningfully ask the question, Why is it conscious? This suggests that an explanation of consciousness will have to go beyond the usual methods of science.  Consciousness therefore presents a hard problem for science, or perhaps it marks the limits of what science can explain.  Explaining why consciousness occurs at all can be contrasted with so-called “easy problems” of consciousness:  the problems of explaining the function, dynamics, and structure of consciousness.  These features can be explained using the usual methods of science.  But that leaves the question of why there is something it is like for the subject when these functions, dynamics, and structures are present.  This is the hard problem.

In more detail, the challenge arises because it does not seem that the qualitative and subjective aspects of conscious experience—how consciousness “feels” and the fact that it is directly “for me”—fit into a physicalist ontology, one consisting of just the basic elements of physics plus structural, dynamical, and functional combinations of those basic elements.  It appears that even a complete specification of a creature in physical terms leaves unanswered the question of whether or not the creature is conscious.  And it seems that we can easily conceive of creatures just like us physically and functionally that nonetheless lack consciousness.  This indicates that a physical explanation of consciousness is fundamentally incomplete:  it leaves out what it is like to be the subject, for the subject.  There seems to be an unbridgeable explanatory gap between the physical world and consciousness.  All these factors make the hard problem hard.

The hard problem was so-named by David Chalmers in 1995.  The problem is a major focus of research in contemporary philosophy of mind, and there is a considerable body of empirical research in psychology, neuroscience, and even quantum physics.  The problem touches on issues in ontology, on the nature and limits of scientific explanation, and on the accuracy and scope of introspection and first-person knowledge, to name but a few.  Reactions to the hard problem range from an outright denial of the issue  to naturalistic reduction to panpsychism (the claim that everything is conscious to some degree) to full-blown mind-body dualism.

Table of Contents

  1. Stating the Problem
    1. Chalmers
    2. Nagel
    3. Levine
  2. Underlying Reasons for the Problem
  3. Responses to the Problem
    1. Eliminativism
    2. Strong Reductionism
    3. Weak Reductionism
    4. Mysterianism
    5. Interactionist Dualism
    6. Epiphenomenalism
    7. Dual Aspect Theory/Neutral Monism/Panpsychism
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Stating the Problem

a. Chalmers

David Chalmers coined the name “hard problem” (1995, 1996), but the problem is not wholly new, being a key element of the venerable mind-body problem.  Still, Chalmers is among those most responsible for the outpouring of work on this issue.  The problem arises because “phenomenal consciousness,” consciousness characterized in terms of “what it’s like for the subject,” fails to succumb to the standard sort of functional explanation successful elsewhere in psychology (compare Block 1995).   Psychological phenomena like learning, reasoning, and remembering can all be explained in terms of playing the right “functional role.”  If a system does the right thing, if it alters behavior appropriately in response to environmental stimulation, it counts as learning.  Specifying these functions tells us what learning is and allows us to see how brain processes could play this role.  But according to Chalmers,

What makes the hard problem hard and almost unique is that it goes beyond problems about the performance of functions. To see this, note that even when we have explained the performance of all the cognitive and behavioral functions in the vicinity of experience—perceptual discrimination, categorization, internal access, verbal report—there may still remain a further unanswered question:  Why is the performance of these functions accompanied by experience? (1995, 202, emphasis in original).

Chalmers explains the persistence of this question by arguing against the possibility of a “reductive explanation” for phenomenal consciousness (hereafter, I will generally just use the term ‘consciousness’ for the phenomenon causing the problem).  A reductive explanation in Chalmers’s sense (following David Lewis (1972)), provides a form of deductive argument concluding with an identity statement between the target explanandum (the thing we are trying to explain) and a lower-level phenomenon that is physical in nature or more obviously reducible to the physical.  Reductive explanations of this type have two premises.  The first presents a functional analysis of the target phenomenon, which fully characterizes the target in terms of its functional role.  The second presents an empirically-discovered realizer of the functionally characterized target, one playing that very functional role.  Then, by transitivity of identity, the target and realizer are deduced to be identical.  For example, the gene may be reductively explained in terms of DNA as follows:

  1. The gene = the unit of hereditary transmission.  (By analysis.)
  2. Regions of DNA = the unit of hereditary transmission.  (By empirical investigation.)
  3. Therefore, the gene = regions of DNA. (By transitivity of identity, 1, 2.)

Chalmers contends that such reductive explanations are available in principle for all other natural phenomena, but not for consciousness.  This is the hard problem.

The reason that reductive explanation fails for consciousness, according to Chalmers, is that it cannot be functionally analyzed.  This is demonstrated by the continued conceivability of what Chalmers terms “zombies”—creatures physically (and so functionally) identical to us, but lacking consciousness—even in the face of a range of proffered functional analyses.  If we had a satisfying functional analysis of consciousness, zombies should not be conceivable.  The lack of a functional analysis is also shown by the continued conceivability of spectrum inversion (perhaps what it looks like for me to see green is what it looks like when you see red), the persistence of the “other minds” problem, the plausibility of the “knowledge argument” (Jackson 1982) and the manifest implausibility of offered functional characterizations.  If consciousness really could be functionally characterized, these problems would disappear.  Since they retain their grip on philosophers, scientists, and lay-people alike, we can conclude that no functional characterization is available.  But then the first premise of a reductive explanation cannot be properly formulated, and reductive explanation fails.  We are left, Chalmers claims, with the following stark choice:  either eliminate consciousness (deny that it exists at all) or add consciousness to our ontology as an unreduced feature of reality, on par with gravity and electromagnetism.  Either way, we are faced with a special ontological problem, one that resists solution by the usual reductive methods.

b. Nagel

Thomas Nagel sees the problem as turning on the “subjectivity” of conscious mental states (1974, 1986).  He argues that the facts about conscious states are inherently subjective—they can only be fully grasped from limited types of viewpoints.  However, scientific explanation demands an objective characterization of the facts, one that moves away from any particular point of view.  Thus, the facts about consciousness elude science and so make “the mind-body problem really intractable” (Nagel 1974, 435).

Nagel argues for the inherent subjectivity of the facts about consciousness by reflecting on the question of what it is like to be a bat—for the bat.  It seems that no amount of objective data will provide us with this knowledge, given that we do not share its type of point of view (the point of view of a creature able to fly and echolocate).  Learning all we can about the brain mechanisms, biochemistry, evolutionary history, psychophysics, and so forth, of a bat still leaves us unable to discover (or even imagine) what it’s like for the bat to hunt by echolocation on a dark night.  But it is still plausible that there are facts about what it’s like to be a bat, facts about how things seem from the bat’s perspective.  And even though we may have good reason to believe that consciousness is a physical phenomenon (due to considerations of mental causation, the success of materialist science, and so on), we are left in the dark about the bat’s conscious experience.  This is the hard problem of consciousness.

c. Levine

Joseph Levine argues that there is a special “explanatory gap” between consciousness and the physical (1983, 1993, 2001).  The challenge of closing this explanatory gap is the hard problem.  Levine argues that a good scientific explanation ought to deductively entail what it explains, allowing us to infer the presence of the target phenomenon from a statement of laws or mechanisms and initial conditions (Levine 2001, 74-76).  Deductive entailment is a logical relation where if the premises of an argument are true, the conclusion must be true as well.  For example, once we discover that lightning is nothing more than an electrical discharge, knowing that the proper conditions for a relevantly large electrical discharge existed in the atmosphere at time t allows us to deduce that lightning must have occurred at time t.  If such a deduction is not possible, there are three possible reasons, according to Levine.  One is that we have not fully specified the laws or mechanisms cited in our explanation.  Two is that the target phenomenon is stochastic in nature, and the best that can be inferred is a conclusion about the probability of the occurrence of the explanatory target.  The third is that there are as yet unknown factors at least partially involved in determining the phenomenon in question.  If we have adequately specified the laws and mechanisms in question, and if we have adjusted for stochastic phenomena, then we should possess a deductive conclusion about our explanatory target, or the third possibility is in effect.  But the third possibility is “precisely an admission that we don't have an adequate explanation” (2001, 76).

And this is the case with consciousness, according to Levine.  No matter how detailed our specification of brain mechanisms or physical laws, it seems that there is an open question about whether consciousness is present.  We can still meaningfully ask if consciousness occurred, even if we accept that the laws, mechanisms, and proper conditions are in place.  And it seems that any further information of this type that we add to our explanation will still suffer from the same problem.  Thus, there is an explanatory gap between the physical and consciousness, leaving us with the hard problem.

2. Underlying Reasons for the Problem

But what it is about consciousness that generates the hard problem?  It may just seem obvious that consciousness could not be physical or functional.  But it is worthwhile to try and draw a rough circle around the problematic features of conscious experience, if we can.  This both clarifies what we are talking about when we talk about consciousness and helps isolate the data a successful theory must explain.

Uriah Kriegel (2009; see also Levine 2001) offers a helpful conceptual division of consciousness into two components.  Starting with the standard understanding of conscious states as states there is something it’s like for the organism to be in, Kriegel notes that we can either focus on the fact that something appears for the organism or we can focus on what it is that appears, the something it’s like.  Focusing on the former, we find that subjects are aware of their conscious states in a distinctive way.  Kriegel labels this feature the subjective component of consciousness.    Focusing on the latter we find the experienced character of consciousness—the “redness of red” or the painfulness of pain— often termed “qualia” or “phenomenal character” in the literature (compare Crane 2000).  Kriegel labels this the qualitative component of consciousness.

Subdividing consciousness in this way allows us to concentrate on how we are conscious and what we are conscious of.  When we focus on the subjective “how” component, we find that conscious states are presented to the subject in a seemingly immediate way.  And when we focus on the qualitative “what” component, we find that consciousness presents us with seemingly indescribable qualities which in principle can vary independently of mental functioning.  These features help explain why consciousness generates the hard problem.

The first feature, which we can call immediacy, concerns the way we access consciousness from the first-person perspective.  Conscious states are accessed in a seemingly unmediated way.  It appears that nothing comes between us and our conscious states.  We seem to access them simply by having them—we do not infer their presence by way of any evidence or argument.  This immediacy creates the impression that there is no way we could be wrong about the content of our conscious states.  Error in perception or error in reasoning can be traced back to poor perceptual conditions or to a failure of rational inference.  But in the absence of such accessible sources of error, it seems that there is no room for inaccuracy in the introspective case.  And even if we come to believe we are in error in introspection, the evidence for this will be indirect and third-personal—it will lack the subjective force of immediacy.  Thus, there is an intuition of special accuracy or even infallibility when it comes to knowing our own conscious states.  We might be wrong that an object in the world is really red, but can we be wrong that it seems red to us?  But if we cannot be wrong about how things seem to us and conscious states seem inexplicable, then they really are inexplicable.  In this way, the immediacy of the subjective component of consciousness underwrites the hard problem.

But what we access may be even more problematic than how we access it:  we might, after all, have had immediate access to the physical nature of our conscious states (see P.M. Churchland 1985).  But conscious experience instead reveals various sensory qualities—the redness of the visual experience of an apple or the painfulness of a stubbed toe, for example.  But these qualities seem to defy informative description.  If one has not experienced them, then no amount of description will adequately convey what it’s like to have such an experience with these qualities.  We can call this feature of the qualitative component of consciousness indescribability. If someone has never seen red (a congenitally blind person, for example), it seems there is nothing informative we could say to convey to them the true nature of this quality.  We might mention prototypical red objects or explain that red is more similar to purple than it is to green, but such descriptions seem to leave the quality itself untouched.  And if experienced qualities cannot be informatively described, how could they be adequately captured in an explanatory theory?  It seems that by their very nature, conscious qualities defy explanation.  This difficulty lies at the heart of the hard problem.

A further problematic feature of what we access is that we can easily imagine our conscious mental processes occurring in conjunction with different conscious qualities or in the absence of consciousness altogether.  The particular qualities that accompany specific mental operations—like the reddish quality accompanying our detection and categorization of an apple, say—seem only contingently connected to the functional processes involved in detection and categorization.  We can call this feature of what is accessed independence.  Independence is the apparent lack of connection between conscious qualities and anything else, and it underwrites the inverted and absent qualia thought experiments used by Chalmers to establish the hard problem (compare Block 1980).  If conscious qualities really are independent in this way, then there seems to be no way to effectively tie them to the rest of reality.

The challenge of the hard problem, then, is to explain consciousness given that it seems to give us immediate access to indescribable and independent qualities.  If we can explain these underlying features, then we may see how to fit consciousness into a physicalist ontology.  Or it perhaps taking these features seriously motivates a rejection of physicalism and the acceptance of conscious qualities as fundamental features of our ontology.  The following section briefly surveys the range of responses to the hard problem, from eliminativism and reductionism to panpsychism and full-blown dualism.

3. Responses to the Problem

a. Eliminativism

Eliminativism holds that there is no hard problem of consciousness because there is no consciousness to worry about in the first place.  Eliminativism is most clearly defended by Rey 1997, but see also Dennett 1978, 1988, Wilkes 1984, and Ryle 1949.  On the face of it, this response sounds absurd:  how can one deny that conscious experience exists?  Consciousness might be the one thing that is certain in our epistemology.  But eliminativist views resist the idea that what we call experience is equivalent to consciousness, at least in the phenomenal, “what it’s like” sense.  They hold that consciousness so-conceived is a philosopher’s construction, one that can be rejected without absurdity.  If it is definitional of consciousness that it is nonfunctional, then holding that the mind is fully functional amounts to a denial of consciousness.  Alternately, if qualia are construed as nonrelational, intrinsic qualities of experience, then one might deny that qualia exist (Dennett 1988).  And if qualia are essential to consciousness, this, too, amounts to an eliminativism about consciousness.

What might justify consciousness eliminativism?  First, the very notion of consciousness, upon close examination, may not have well-defined conditions of application—there may be no single phenomenon that the term picks out (Wilkes 1984).  Or the term may serve no use at all in any scientific theory, and so may drop out of a scientifically-fixed ontology (Rey 1997).  If science tells us what there is (as some naturalists hold), and science has no place for nonfunctional intrinsic qualities, then there is no consciousness, so defined.  Finally, it might be that the term ‘consciousness’ gets its meaning as part of a falsifiable theory, our folk psychology. The entities posited by a theory stand or fall with the success of the theory.  If the theory is falsified, then the entities it posits do not exist (compare P.M. Churchland 1981).  And there is no guarantee that folk psychology will not be supplanted by a better theory of the mind, perhaps a neuroscientific or even quantum mechanical theory, at some point.  Thus, consciousness might be eliminated from our ontology.  If that occurs, obviously there is no hard problem to worry about.  No consciousness, no problem!

But eliminativism seems much too strong a reaction to the hard problem, one that throws the baby out with the bathwater.  First, it is highly counterintuitive to deny that consciousness exists.  It seems extremely basic to our conception of minds and persons.  A more desirable view would avoid this move.  Second, it is not clear why we must accept that consciousness, by definition, is nonfunctional or intrinsic.  Definitional, “analytic” claims are highly controversial at best, particularly with difficult terms like ‘consciousness’ (compare Quine 1951, Wittgenstein 1953).  A better solution would hold that consciousness still exists, but it is functional and relational in nature.  This is the strong reductionist approach.

b. Strong Reductionism

Strong reductionism holds that consciousness exists, but contends that it is reducible to tractable functional, nonintrinsic properties.  Strong reductionism further claims that the reductive story we tell about consciousness fully explains, without remainder, all that needs to be explained about consciousness.  Reductionism, generally, is the idea that complex phenomena can be explained in terms of the arrangement and functioning of simpler, better understood parts.  Key to strong reductionism, then, is the idea that consciousness can be broken down and explained in terms of simpler things.  This amounts to a rejection of the idea that experience is simple and basic, that it stands as a kind of epistemic or metaphysical “ground floor.”  Strong reductionists must hold that consciousness is not as it prima facie appears, that it only seems to be marked by immediacy, indescribability, and independence and therefore that it only seems nonfunctional and intrinsic.  Consciousness, according to strong reductionism, can be fully analyzed and explained in functional terms, even if it does not seem that way.

A number of prominent strongly reductive theories exist in the literature.  Functionalist approaches hold that consciousness is nothing more than a functional process.  A popular version of this view is the “global workspace” hypothesis, which holds that conscious states are mental states available for processing by a wide range of cognitive systems (Baars 1988, 1997; Dehaene & Naccache 2001).  They are available in this way by being present in a special network—the “global workspace.”  This workspace can be functionally characterized and it also can be given a neurological interpretation.  In answer to the question “why are these states conscious?” it can be replied that this is what it means to be conscious.  If a state is available to the mind in this way, it is a conscious state (see also Dennett 1991).  (For more neuroscientifically-focused versions of the functionalist approach, see P.S Churchland 1986; Crick 1994; and Koch 2004.)

Another set of views that can be broadly termed functionalist is “enactive” or “embodied” approaches (Hurley 1998, Noë 2005, 2009).  These views hold that mental processes should not be characterized in terms of strictly inner processes or representations.  Rather, they should be cashed out in terms of the dynamic processes connecting perception, bodily and environmental awareness, and behavior.  These processes, the views contend, do not strictly depend on processes inside the head; rather, they loop out into the body and the environment.  Further, the nature of consciousness is tied up with behavior and action—it cannot be isolated as a passive process of receiving and recording information.  These views are cataloged as functionalist because of the way they answer the hard problem:  these physical states (constituted in part by bodily and worldly things) are conscious because they play the right functional role, they do the right thing.

Another strongly reductive approach holds that conscious states are states representing the world in the appropriate way (Dretske 1995, Tye 1995, 2000).  This view, known as “first-order representationalism,” contends that conscious states make us aware of things in world by representing them.  Further, these representations are “nonconceptual” in nature:  they represent features even if the subject in question lacks the concepts needed to cognitively categorize those features.  But these nonconceptual representations must play the right functional role in order to be conscious.  They must be poised to influence the higher-level cognitive systems of a subject.  The details of these representations differ from theorist to theorist, but a common answer to the hard problem emerges.  First-order representational states are conscious because they do the right thing:  they make us aware of just the sorts of features that make up conscious experience, features like the redness of an apple, the sweetness of honey, or the shrillness of a trumpet.  Further, such representations are conscious because they are poised to play the right role in our understanding of the world—they serve as the initial layer of our epistemic contact  with reality, a layer we can then use as the basis of our more sophisticated beliefs and theories.

A further point serves to support the claims of first-order representationalism.  When we reflect on our experience in a focused way, we do not seem to find any distinctively mental properties.  Rather, we find the very things first-order representationalism claims we represent:  the basic sensory features of the world.  If I ask you to reflect closely on your experience of a tree, you do not find special mental qualities.  Rather, you find the tree, as it appears to you, as you represent it.  This consideration, known as “transparency,” seems to undermine the claim that we need to posit special intrinsic qualia, seemingly irreducible properties of our experiences (Harman 1990, though see Kind 2003).  Instead, we can explain all that we experience in terms of representation.  We have a red experience because we represent physical red in the right way.  It is then argued that representation can be given a reductive explanation.  Representation, even the sort of representation involved in experience, is no more than various functional/physical processes of our brains tracking the environment.  It follows that there is no further hard problem to deal with.

A third type of strongly reductive approach is higher-order representationalism (Armstrong 1968, 1981; Rosenthal 1986, 2005; Lycan 1987, 1996, 2001; Carruthers 2000, 2005).  This view starts with the question of what accounts for the difference between conscious and nonconscious mental states.  Higher-order theorists hold that an intuitive answer is that we are appropriately aware of our conscious states, while we are unaware of our nonconscious states.  The task of a theory of consciousness, then, is to explain the awareness accounting for this difference.  Higher-order representationalists contend that the awareness is a product of a specific sort of representation, a representation that picks out the subject’s own mental states.  These “higher-order” representations (representations of other representations) make the subject aware of her states, thus accounting for consciousness.  In answer to the hard problem, the higher-order theorist responds that these states are conscious because the subject is appropriately aware of them by way of higher-order representation.  The higher-order representations themselves are held to be nonconscious.  And since representation can plausibly be reduced to functional/physical processes, there is no lingering problem to explain (though see Gennaro 2005 for more on this strategy).

A final strongly reductive view, “self-representationalism,” holds that troubles with the higher-order view demand that we characterize the awareness subjects have of their conscious states as a kind of self-representation, where one complex representational state is about both the world and that very state itself (Gennaro 1996, Kriegel 2003, 2009, Van Gulick 2004, 2006, Williford 2006).  It may seem paradoxical to say that a state can represent itself, but this can dealt with by holding that the state represents itself in virtue of one part of the state representing another, and thereby coming to indirectly represent the whole.  Further, self-representationalism may provide the best explanation of the seemingly ubiquitous presence of self-awareness in conscious experience.  And, again, in answer to the question of why such states are conscious, the self-representationalist can respond that conscious states are ones the subject is aware of, and self-representationalism explains this awareness.  And since self-representation, properly construed, is reducible to functional/physical processes, we are left with a complete explanation of consciousness.  (For more details on how higher-order/self-representational views deal with the hard problem, see Gennaro 2012, chapter 4.)

However, there remains considerable resistance to strongly reductive views.  The main stumbling block is that they seem to leave unaddressed the pressing intuition that one can easily conceive of a system satisfying all the requirements of the strongly reductive views but still lacking consciousness (Chalmers 1996, chapter 3).  It is argued that an effective theory ought to close off such easy conceptions.  Further, strong reductivists seem committed to the claim that there is no knowledge of consciousness that cannot be grasped theoretically.  If a strongly reductive view is true, it seems that a blind person can gain full knowledge of color experience from a textbook.  But surely she still lacks some knowledge of what it’s like to see red, for example?  Strongly reductive theorists can contend that these recalcitrant intuitions are merely a product of lingering confused or erroneous views of consciousness.  But in the face of such worries, many have felt it better to find a way to respect these intuitions while still denying the potentially unpleasant ontological implications of the hard problem.  Hence, weak reductionism.

c. Weak Reductionism

Weak reductionism, in contrast to the strong version, holds that consciousness is a simple or basic phenomenon, one that cannot be informatively broken down into simpler nonconscious elements.  But according to the view we can still identify consciousness with physical properties if the most parsimonious and productive theory supports such an identity (Block 2002, Block & Stalnaker 1999, Hill 1997, Loar 1997, 1999, Papineau 1993, 2002, Perry 2001).  What’s more, once the identity has been established, there is no further burden of explanation.  Identities have no explanation:  a thing just is what it is.  To ask how it could be that Mark Twain is Sam Clemens, once we have the most parsimonious rendering of the facts, is to go beyond meaningful questioning.  And the same holds for the identity of conscious states with physical states.

But there remains the question of why the identity claim appears so counterintuitive and here weak reductionists generally appeal to the “phenomenal concepts strategy” (PCS) to make their case (compare Stoljar 2005).  The PCS holds that the hard problem is not the result of a dualism of facts, phenomenal and physical, but rather a dualism of concepts picking out fully physical conscious states.  One concept is the third-personal physical concept of neuroscience.  The other concept is a distinctively first-personal “phenomenal concept”—one that picks out conscious states in a subjectively direct manner.  Because of the subjective differences in these modes of conceptual access, consciousness does not seem intuitively to be physical.  But once we understand the differences in the two concepts, there is no need to accept this intuition.

Here is a sketch of how a weakly reductive view of consciousness might proceed.  First, we find stimuli that reliably trigger reports of phenomenally conscious states from subjects.  Then we find what neural processes are reliably correlated with those reported experiences.  It can then be argued on the basis of parsimony that the reported conscious state just is the neural state—an ontology holding that two states are present is less simple than one identifying the two states.  Further, accepting the identity is explanatorily fruitful, particularly with respect to mental causation.  Finally, the PCS is appealed to in order to explain why the identity remains counterintuitive.  And as to the question of why this particular neural state should be identical to this particular phenomenal state, the answer is that this is just the way things are.  Explanation bottoms out at this point and requests for further explanation are unreasonable.

But there are pressing worries about weak reductionism.  There seems to be an undischarged phenomenal element within the weakly reductive view (Chalmers 2006).  When we focus on the PCS, it seems that we lack a plausible story about how it is that phenomenal concepts reveal what it’s like for us in experience.  The direct access of phenomenal concepts seems to require that phenomenal states themselves inform us of what they are like. A common way to cash out the PCS is to say that the phenomenal properties themselves are embedded in the phenomenal concepts, and that alone makes them accessible in the seemingly rich manner of introspected experience.  When it is asked how phenomenal properties might underwrite this access, the answer given is that this is in the nature of phenomenal properties—that is just what they do.  Again, we are told that explanation must stop somewhere.  But at this point, it seems that there is little to distinguish that weak reductionist from the various forms of nonreductive and dualistic views cataloged below.  They, too, hold that it is in the nature of phenomenal properties to underwrite first-person access.  But they hold that there is no good reason to think that properties with this sort of nature are physical.  We know of no other physical property that possesses such a nature.  All that we are left with to recommend weak reductionism is a thin claim of parsimony and an overly-strong fealty to physicalism.  We are asked to accept a brute identity here, one that seems unprecedented in our ontology given that consciousness is a macro-level phenomenon.  Other examples of such brute identity—of electricity and magnetism into one force, say—occur at the foundational level of physics.  Neurological and phenomenal properties do not seem to be basic in this way.  We are left with phenomenal properties inexplicable in physical terms, “brutally” identified with neurological properties in a way that nothing else seems to be.  Why not take all this as an indication that phenomenal properties are not physical after all?

The weak reductionist can respond that the question of mental causation still provides a strong enough reason to hold onto physicalism.  A plausible scientific principal is that the physical world is causally closed:  all physical events have physical causes.  And since our bodies are physical, it seems that denying that consciousness is physical renders it epiphenomenal.  The apparent implausibility of epiphenomenalism may be enough to motivate adherence to weak reductionism, even with its explanatory short-comings.  Dualistic challenges to this claim will be discussed in later sections.

It is possible, however, to embrace weak reductionism and still acknowledge that some questions remain to be answered.  For example, it might be reasonable to demand some explanation of how particular neural states correlate with differences in conscious experience.  A weak reductionist might hold that this is a question we at present cannot answer.  It may be that one day we will be in a position to so, due to a radical shift in our understanding of consciousness or physical reality.  Or perhaps this will remain an unsolvable mystery, one beyond our limited abilities to decipher.  Still, there may be good reasons to hold at present that the most parsimonious metaphysical picture is the physicalist picture.  The line between weak reductionism and the next set of views to be considered, mysterianism, may blur considerably here.

d. Mysterianism

The mysterian response to the hard problem does not offer a solution; rather, it holds that the hard problem cannot be solved by current scientific method and perhaps cannot be solved by human beings at all.  There are two varieties of the view.  The more moderate version of the position, which can be termed “temporary mysterianism,” holds that given the current state of scientific knowledge, we have no explanation of why some physical states are conscious (Nagel 1974,  Levine 2001).  The gap between experience and the sorts of things dealt with in modern physics—functional, structural, and dynamical properties of basic fields and particles—is simply too wide to be bridged at present.  Still, it may be that some future conceptual revolution in the sciences will show how to close the gap.  Such massive conceptual reordering is certainly possible, given the history of science.  And, indeed, if one accepts the Kuhnian idea of shifts between incommensurate paradigms, it might seem unsurprising that we, pre-paradigm-shift, cannot grasp what things will be like after the revolution.  But at present we have no idea how the hard problem might be solved.

Thomas Nagel, in sketching his version of this idea, calls for a future “objective phenomenology” which will “describe, at least in part, the subjective character of experiences in a form comprehensible to beings incapable of having those experiences” (1974, 449).  Without such a new conceptual system, Nagel holds, we are left unable to bridge the gap between consciousness and the physical.  Consciousness may indeed be a physical, but we at present have no idea how this could be so.

It is of course open for both weak and strong reductionists to accept a version of temporary mysterianism.  They can agree that at present we do not know how consciousness fits into the physical world, but the possibility is open that future science will clear up the mystery.  The main difference between such claims by reductionists and by mysterians is that the mysterians reject the idea that current reductive proposals do anything at all to close the gap.  How different the explanatory structure must be to count as truly new and not merely an extension of the old is not possible to gauge with any precision.  So the difference between a very weak reductionist and a temporary, though optimistic mysterian may not amount to much.

The stronger version of the position, “permanent mysterianism,” argues that our ignorance in the face of the hard problem is not merely transitory, but is permanent, given our limited cognitive capacities (McGinn 1989, 1991).  We are like squirrels trying to understand quantum mechanics:  it just is not going to happen.  The main exponent of this view is Colin McGinn, who argues that a solution to the hard problem is “cognitively closed” to us.  He supports his position by stressing consequences of a modular view of the mind, inspired in part by Chomsky’s work in linguistics.  Our mind just may not be built to solve this sort of problem.  Instead, it may be composed of dedicated, domain-specific “modules” devoted to solving local, specific problems for an organism.  An organism without a dedicated “language acquisition device” equipped with “universal grammar” cannot acquire language.  Perhaps the hard problem requires cognitive apparatus we just do not possess as a species.  If that is the case, no further scientific or philosophical breakthrough will make a difference.  We are not built to solve the problem:  it is cognitively closed to us.

A worry about such a claim is that it is hard to establish just what sorts of problems are permanently beyond our ken.  It seems possible that the temporary mysterian may be correct here, and what looks unbridgeable in principle is really just a temporary roadblock.  Both the temporary and permanent mysterian agree on the evidence.  They agree that there is a real gap at present between consciousness and the physical and they agree that nothing in current science seems up to the task of solving the problem.  The further claim that we are forever blocked from solving the problem turns on controversial claims about the nature of the problem and the nature of our cognitive capacities.  Perhaps those controversial claims will be made good, but at present, it is hard to see why we should give up all hope, given the history of surprising scientific breakthroughs.

e. Interactionist Dualism

Perhaps, though, we know enough already to establish that consciousness is not a physical phenomenon.   This brings us to what has been, historically speaking, the most important response to the hard problem and the more general mind-body problem: dualism, the claim that consciousness is ontologically distinct from anything physical.  Dualism, in its various forms, reasons from the explanatory, epistemological, or conceptual gaps between the phenomenal and the physical to the metaphysical conclusion that the physicalist worldview is incomplete and needs to be supplemented by the addition of irreducibly phenomenal substance or properties.

Dualism can be unpacked in a number of ways.  Substance dualism holds that consciousness makes up a distinct fundamental “stuff” which can exist independently of any physical substance.  Descartes’ famous dualism was of this kind (Descartes 1640/1984).  A more popular modern dualist option is property dualism, which holds that the conscious mind is not a separate substance from the physical brain, but that phenomenal properties are nonphysical properties of the brain.  On this view, it is metaphysically possible that the physical substrate occurs without the phenomenal properties, indicating their ontological independence, but phenomenal properties cannot exist on their own.  The properties might emerge from some combination of nonphenomenal properties (emergent dualism—compare Broad 1925) or they might be present as a fundamental feature of reality, one that necessarily correlates with physical matter in our world, but could in principle come apart from the physical in another possible world.

A key question for dualist views concerns the relationship between consciousness and the physical world, particularly our physical bodies.  Descartes held that conscious mental properties can have a causal impact upon physical matter—this is known as interactionist dualism.  Recent defenders of interactionist dualism include Foster 1991, Hodgson 1991, Lowe 1996, Popper and Eccles 1977, H. Robinson 1982, Stapp 1993, and Swinburne 1986.  However, interactionist dualism requires rejecting the “causal closure” of the physical domain, the claim that every physical event is fully determined by a physical cause.  Causal closure is a long-held principle in the sciences, so its rejection marks a strong break from current scientific orthodoxy (though see Collins 2011).  Another species of dualism accepts the causal closure of physics, but still holds that phenomenal properties are metaphysically distinct from physical properties.  This compatibilism is achieved at the price of consciousness epiphenomenalism, the view that conscious properties can be caused by physical events, but they cannot in turn cause physical events.  I will discuss interactionist dualism in this section, including a consideration of how quantum mechanics might open up a workable space for an acceptable dualist interactionist view.   I will discuss epiphenomenalism in the following section.

Interactionist dualism, of both the substance and property type, holds that consciousness is causally efficacious in the production of bodily behavior.  This is certainly a strongly intuitive position to take with regard to mental causation, but it requires rejecting the causal closure of the physical.  It is widely thought that the principle of causal closure is central to modern science, on par with basic conservation principles like the conservation of energy or matter in a physical reaction (see, for example, Kim 1998).  And at macroscopic scales, the principle appears well-supported by empirical evidence.  However, at the quantum level it is more plausible to question causal closure.  On one reading of quantum mechanics, the progression of quantum-level events unfolds in a deterministic progression until an observation occurs.  At that point, some views hold that the progression of events becomes indeterminstic.  If so, there may be room for consciousness to influence how such “decoherence” occurs—that is, how the quantum “wave function” collapses into the classical, observable macroscopic world we experience.  How such a process occurs is the subject of speculative theorizing in quantum theories of consciousness.  It may be that such views are better cataloged as physicalist:  the properties involved might well be labeled as physical in a completed science (see, for example, Penrose 1989, 1994; Hameroff 1998).  If so, the quantum view is better seen as strongly or weakly reductive.

Still, it might be that the proper cashing out of the idea of “observation” in quantum theory requires positing consciousness as an unreduced primitive.  Observation may require something intrinsically conscious, rather than something characterized in the relational terms of physical theory.   In that case, phenomenal properties would be metaphysically distinct from the physical, traditionally characterized, while playing a key role in physical theory—the role of collapsing the wave function by observation.  Thus, there seems to be theoretical space for a dualist view which rejects closure but maintains a concordance with basic physical theory.

Sill, such views face considerable challenges.  They are beholden to particular interpretations of quantum mechanics and this is far from a settled field, to put it mildly.  It may well be that the best interpretation of quantum mechanics rejects the key assumption of indeterminacy here (see Albert 1993 for the details of this debate).  Further, the kinds of indeterminacies discoverable at the quantum level may not correspond in any useful way to our ordinary idea of mental causes.  The pattern of decoherence may have little to do with my conscious desire to grab a beer causing me to go to the fridge.  Finally, there is the question of how phenomenal properties at the quantum level come together to make up the conscious experience we have.  Our conscious mental lives are not themselves quantum phenomenon—how, then, do micro-phenomenal quantum-level properties combine to constitute our experiences?  Still, this is an alluring area of investigation, bringing together the mysteries of consciousness and quantum mechanics.  But such a mix may only compound our explanatory troubles!

f. Epiphenomenalism

A different dualistic approach accepts the causal closure of physics by holding that phenomenal properties have no causal influence on the physical world (Campbell 1970, Huxley 1874, Jackson 1982, and W.S. Robinson 1988, 2004).  Thus, any physical effect, like a bodily behavior, will have a fully physical cause.  Phenomenal properties merely accompany causally efficacious physical properties, but they are not involved in making the behavior happen.  Phenomenal properties, on this view, may be lawfully correlated with physical properties, thus assuring that whenever a brain event of a particular type occurs, a phenomenal property of a particular type occurs.  For example, it may be that bodily damage causes activity in the amygdala, which in turn causes pain-appropriate behavior like screaming or cringing.   The activity in the amygdala will also cause the tokening of phenomenal pain properties.  But these properties are out of the causal chain leading to the behavior.  They are like the activity of a steam whistle relative to the causal power of the steam engine moving a train’s wheels.

Such a view has no obvious logical flaw, but it is in strong conflict with our ordinary notions of how conscious states are related to behavior.  It is extremely intuitive that our pains at times cause us to scream or cringe.  But on the epiphenomenalist view, that cannot be the case.  What’s more, our knowledge of our conscious states cannot be caused by the phenomenal qualities of our experiences.  On the epiphenomenalist view, my knowledge that I’m in pain is not caused by the pain itself.  This, too, seems absurd:  surely, the feeling of pain is causally implicated in my knowledge of that pain!  But the epiphenomenalist can simply bite the bullet here and reject the commonsense picture.  We often discover odd things when we engage in serious investigation, and this may be one of them.  Denying commonsense intuition is better than denying a basic scientific principle like causal closure, according to epiphenomenalists.  And it may be that experimental results in the sciences undermine the causal efficacy of consciousness as well, so this is not so outrageous a claim (See Libet, 2004; Wegner 2002, for example).  Further, the epiphenomenalist can deny that we need a causal theory of first-person knowledge.  It may be that our knowledge of our conscious states is achieved by a unique kind of noncausal acquaintance.  Or maybe merely having the phenomenal states is enough for us to know of them—our knowledge of consciousness may be constituted by phenomenal states, rather than caused by them.  Knowledge of causation is a difficult philosophical area in general, so it may reasonable to offer alternatives to the causal theory in this context.  But despite these possibilities, epiphenomenalism remains a difficult view to embrace because of its strongly counterintuitive nature.

g. Dual Aspect Theory/Neutral Monism/Panpsychism

A final set of views, close in spirit to dualism, hold that phenomenal properties cannot be reduced to more basic physical properties, but might reduce to something more basic still, a substance that is both physical and phenomenal or that underwrites both.  Defenders of such views agree with dualists that the hard problem forces a rethinking of our basic ontology, but they disagree that this entails dualism.  There are several variations of the idea.  It may be that there is a more basic substance underlying all physical matter and this basic substance possesses phenomenal as well as physical properties (dual aspect theory:  Spinoza 1677/2005, P. Strawson 1959, Nagel 1986).  Or it may be that this more basic substance is “neutral”—neither phenomenal nor physical, yet somehow underlying both (neutral monism:  Russell 1926, Feigl 1958, Maxwell 1979, Lockwood 1989, Stubenberg 1998, Stoljar 2001, G. Strawson 2008).  Or it may be that phenomenal properties are the intrinsic categorical bases for the relational, dispositional properties described in physics and so everything physical has an underlying phenomenal nature (panpsychism:  Leibniz 1714/1989, Whitehead 1929, Griffin 1998, Rosenberg 2005, Skrbina 2007).  These views have all received detailed elaboration in past eras of philosophy, but they have seen a distinct revival as responses to the hard problem.

There is considerable variation in how theorists unpack these kinds of views, so it is only possible here to give generic versions of the ideas.  All three views make consciousness more basic or as basic as physical properties; this is something they share with dualism.  But they disagree about the right way to spell out the metaphysical relations between the phenomenal, the physical, and any more basic substance there might be.  The true differences between the views are not always clear even to the views’ defenders, but we can try to tease them apart here.

A dual-aspect view holds that there is one basic underlying stuff that possesses both physical and phenomenal properties.  These properties may only be instantiated when the right combinations of the basic substance are present, so panpsychism is not a necessary entailment of the view.  For example, when the basic substance is configured in the form of a brain, it then realizes phenomenal as well as physical properties.  But that need not be the case when the fundamental stuff makes up a table.  But in any event, phenomenal properties are not themselves reducible to physical properties.  There is a fine line between such views and dualist views, mainly turning on the difference between constitution and lawful correlation.

Neutral monist views hold that there is a more basic neutral substance underlying both the phenomenal and the physical.  ‘Neutral’ here means that the underlying stuff really is neither phenomenal nor physical, so there is a good sense in which such a position is reductive:  it explains the presence of the phenomenal by reference to something else more basic.  This distinguishes it from the dual-aspect approach—on the dual-aspect view, the underlying stuff already possesses phenomenal (and physical) properties, while on neutral monism it does not.  That leaves neutral monism with the challenge of explaining this reductive relationship, as well as explaining how the neutral substance underlies physical reality without itself being physical.

Panpsychism holds that the phenomenal is basic to all matter.  Such views hold that the phenomenal somehow underwrites the physical or is potentially present at all times as a property of a more basic substance.  This view must explain what it means to say that everything is conscious in some sense.  Further, it must explain how it is that the basic phenomenal (or “protophenomenal”) elements combine to form the sorts of properties we are acquainted with in consciousness.  Why is it that some combinations form the experiences we enjoy and others (presumably) do not?

One line of support for these types of views comes from the way that physical theory defines its basic properties in terms of their dispositions to causally interact with each other.  For example, what it is to be a quark of a certain type is just to be disposed to behave in certain ways in the presence of other quarks.  Physical theory is silent about what stuff might underlie or constitute the entities with these dispositions—it deals only in extrinsic or relational properties, not in intrinsic properties.  At the same time, there is reason to hold that consciousness possesses nonrelational intrinsic qualities.  Indeed, this may explain why we cannot know what it’s like to be a bat—that requires knowledge of an intrinsic quality not conveyable by relational description.  Putting these two ideas together, we find a motivation for the sorts of views canvassed here.  Basic physics is silent about the intrinsic categorical bases underlying the dispositional properties described in physical theory.  But it seems plausible that there must be such bases—how could there be dispositions to behave thus-and-so without some categorical base to ground the disposition?  And since we already have reason to believe that conscious qualities are intrinsic, it makes sense to posit phenomenal properties as the categorical bases of basic physical matter. Or we can posit a neutral substance to fill this role, one also realizing phenomenal properties when in the right circumstances.

These views all seem to avoid epiphenomenalism.  Whenever there is a physical cause of behavior, the underlying phenomenal (or neutral) basis will be present to do the work.  But that cause might itself be constituted by the phenomenal, in the senses laid out here.  What’s more, there is nothing in conflict with physics—the properties posited appear at a level below the range of relational physical description.  And they do not conflict with or preempt anything present in physical theory.

But we are left with several worries.  First, it is again the case that phenomenal properties are posited at an extreme micro-level.  How it is that such micro-phenomenal properties cohere into the sorts of experiential properties present in consciousness is unexplained.  What’s more, if we take the panpsychic route, we are faced with the claim that every physical object has a phenomenal nature of some kind.  This may not be incoherent, but it is a counterintuitive result.  But if we do not accept panpsychism, we must explain how the more basic underlying substance differs from the phenomenal and yet instantiates it in the right circumstances.  Simply saying that this just is the nature of the neutral substance is not an informative answer.  Finally, it is unclear how these views really differ from a weakly reductionist account.  Both hold that there is a basic and brute connection between the physical brain and phenomenal consciousness.  On the weakly reductionist account, the connection is one of brute identity.  On the dual-aspect/neutral monist/panpsychic account, it is one of brute constitution, where two properties, the physical and the phenomenal, constantly co-occur (because the one constitute the categorical base of the other, or they are aspects of a more basic stuff, etc.), though they are held to be metaphysically distinct.  Is there any evidence that could decide between the views?  The apparent differences here may be more one of style than of substance, despite the intricacies of these metaphysical debates.

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Author Information

Josh Weisberg
University of Houston
U. S. A.