Feminist-Pragmatism is a philosophical tradition, which draws upon the insights of both feminist and pragmatist theory and practice. It is fundamentally concerned with enlarging philosophical thought through activism and lived experience, and assumes feminist and pragmatist ideas to be mutually beneficial for liberatory causes. Feminist-pragmatism emphasises the need to redress false distinctions, or dualisms, as these usually result in a denigration of one oppositional by another. Thus, feminist-pragmatists critique such bifurcations as thought/action, mind/body, universal/particular, and they show how the skewed favouring of one over the other results in philosophical theories which are incapable of explaining our gendered existences, positions in society, understandings of knowledge, or learning experiences. Feminist-pragmatists contribute to current debates in epistemology, social and political philosophy, philosophy of education, ethics, and metaphysics. Their work reflects the theoretical advances made by feminist theorists especially over the course of the latter part of the twentieth century, while being rooted in the principles and criticisms of the classical pragmatists.

Importantly, contemporary feminist-pragmatists have highlighted the fact that women, indeed feminist women, played a central role in the development of classical pragmatism itself, either by influencing the work of male pragmatist philosophers, or by constituting formidable thinkers in their own right. This means, then, that feminist-pragmatism can be traced to the origins of pragmatism itself, which developed primarily in North America from about the mid-nineteenth century to the mid-twentieth century, coinciding with the Progressive Era of 1890–1920.

This article will begin by presenting early feminist-pragmatism in section one, and will then move on to discuss contemporary feminist-pragmatism in section two. Throughout, the philosophical tradition under discussion will be referred to as feminist-pragmatism, although some theorists refer to it as pragmatist-feminism, or indeed, use both terms interchangeably. Present terminology does not imply a favouring of feminism over pragmatism, but simply indicates a tradition of joint feminist and pragmatist philosophising.

Table of Contents

  1. Early Feminist-Pragmatism
    1. Classical Pragmatism and the Recovery of Feminist- Pragmatist Work
    2. Jane Addams
    3. Early Feminist-Pragmatist Legacy
  2. Contemporary Feminist-Pragmatism
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Early Pragmatist and Feminist-Pragmatist Sources
    2. Contemporary Feminist-Pragmatist Sources:
      1. Introductions or Overviews
      2. More Advanced or Specialised Sources

1. Early Feminist-Pragmatism

a. Classical Pragmatism and the Recovery of Feminist- Pragmatist Work

In the 21st century pragmatism has experienced something of a renaissance, with contemporary philosophers returning to the works of the classical pragmatists, by re-appropriating their insights and methods for current philosophical problems. Among such neo-pragmatists is a growing number of feminist thinkers and activists who seek to particularly utilise pragmatism’s theories and concepts to ameliorate problems originating in oppressive systems structured by gender, race, class, and other markers of difference. As this article will demonstrate, there are several aspects of pragmatist philosophy which appear to overlap with the priorities of feminists, making pragmatism an attractive and valuable resource for a joint feminist-pragmatist approach.

While feminists have therefore found a useful ‘ally’ (Siegfried 1993a, 2) in pragmatism as a means of thinking about selves and the worlds they inhabit, this feminist reengagement with pragmatism has also uncovered hitherto unknown or neglected historical thinkers from the classical period. More often than not, historiographies of pragmatism identify the classical pragmatists as Charles Sanders Peirce, William James, John Dewey, and sometimes to a lesser extent George Herbert Mead, George Santayana, or Josiah Royce (for more on these topics, see Pragmatism). However, feminists have shown that historical accounts, which are limited to only these figures, omit the contributions made by women to the development of pragmatism, and fail to recognise the important role women pragmatists play as classical pragmatists.

For instance, Alice Chipman Dewey, John Dewey’s wife, had a significant impact upon the latter’s thought, indeed, she ran the experimental Lab School at the University of Chicago, where Dewey’s educational theories were given real-life application (see John Dewey). Moreover, Alice’s feminism and religious unorthodoxy formed an important influence in the trajectory Dewey’s idealism and theism took, and it is now generally acknowledged that Dewey’s concern with the social problems of his day can be attributed to Alice (West, 78–79). Dewey and Alice met at the University of Michigan, where women had only recently been allowed to undertake studies, and where Dewey was employed as a young philosophy instructor. They married in 1886, and throughout her lifetime, Alice continued to affect Dewey’s beliefs, being particularly concerned with women’s rights, while going on to expand her knowledge and practice in the field of education – a field she had entered as a teacher before beginning college. Describing her mother as a woman with a “brilliant mind...a sensitive nature combined with indomitable courage and energy,” Jane Dewey held Alice largely responsible for Dewey’s “early widening of...philosophic interests from the commentative and classical to the field of contemporary life” (Dewey 1987, 21). Given that Dewey understood philosophy as a means to redressing the problems of his time, and given that Alice awakened a sort of social consciousness in Dewey, it is obvious what a pivotal role she played in Dewey’s thought, and, in turn, in the development of pragmatism more generally.

While several women influenced pragmatism in such a manner, there are examples of women thinkers from this early period who could legitimately be classed alongside the traditionally acknowledged pragmatists. Thus, recent efforts to recover women pragmatist work have resulted in the identification of Jane Addams as a philosopher and social reformer, whose name should be listed in conjunction with Peirce, James and Dewey in the historical annals of pragmatism. Like Alice Chipman Dewey, Addams had a profound effect on Dewey, however, she was also a prolific writer and activist, who sought to bring about the real-life changes she theorised. Many other pragmatists at the time were connected to Addams, particularly through her activist headquarters and home, Hull House. Addams set up Hull House as a hub for local activities and community organising, as she shared her life with the diverse immigrant groups of one of Chicago’s poorest areas. Hull House soon became a centre for people wishing to contribute to Addams’s vision, and several women emerged from this environment having already effected substantial changes in such diverse areas as education, industrial relations, and architecture, and subsequently going on to establish successful careers, often as the first leading women in their respective chosen fields.

Charlotte Perkins Gilman, for example, stayed in Hull House for a month, and was a prominent social reformer, drawing particular attention to women’s domestic role and the politics of urban planning. Gilman argued that the division of labour disadvantaged and trapped women in the domestic sphere, and she maintained that household work should be professionalised. As such, Gilman has been understood as occupying a place in the history of material feminism, however, she has also been shown to rightfully “belon[g] in pragmatism’s pantheon” (Upin, 56). Beyond Gilman’s obvious relationship with Jane Addams and Hull House, Jane Upin also outlines her possibly personal, but certainly intellectual, connection to John Dewey. In fact, Gilman is said to expand upon the latter’s pragmatist insights by extending the basic principle of ‘environmentalism’ (that is, the notion that human nature can be altered by one’s environment), by theorising women’s confinement in the domestic realm, and the effect this has on women as human beings (Upin, 48–54). Sharing Dewey’s and Addams’s regard for Darwinism, and their opposition to a deterministic reading thereof, Gilman joins her pragmatist contemporaries by coupling Darwinism with a belief in the capacity for human beings to bring about change. Like Addams, she takes such change to be especially pertinent for women, and she is therefore a prime example of an early feminist-pragmatist.

While Hull House formed a focal point for pragmatist activism and intellectualism, the universities at which pragmatists taught fulfilled a similar role. For example, Ella Flagg Young studied with John Dewey at the University of Chicago and earned her doctoral degree on “Isolation in the School” before taking up the post of supervisor of the Lab School. Young was a mature student, having already had a successful career as an educator, and Dewey drew upon her vast experience in developing and applying pragmatist concepts and ideas of education. Both Dewey and Young influenced each other, though, and Dewey actually maintained that Young often underestimated her own pragmatist work, which he described as a “concrete empirical pragmatism with reference to philosophical conceptions before the doctrine was ever formulated in print” (quoted in Seigfried 1996, 81). Following Dewey’s departure from the University of Chicago, Young went on to become the first woman superintendent of Chicago’s public schools, and was also the first woman president of the National Educational Association.

Upon leaving Chicago, Dewey taught Elsie Ripley Clapp at Columbia University, who acted simultaneously as his graduate assistant. This was a long and fruitful collaboration, with Clapp not only helping Dewey to structure and develop courses, but also contributing to research, particularly on education. Dewey appears to have gained insights from her, which he acknowledges in private correspondence, or rather obtusely in his published work. For example, Charlene Haddock Siegfried points out that Dewey states his indebtedness to her (and to other women influences) not in the main text of his works, but rather in the preface (or in footnotes, as the case may be), leaving Clapp’s precise input obscure, and obfuscating the exact nature and scale thereof. And yet, her role is a significant one, as Dewey describes in a letter his indebtedness in profuse terms, noting that “such a generous exploitation of your ideas as is likely to result if and when I publish the outcome, seems to go beyond the limit” (Seigfried 1996, 50). Indeed, Dewey supported Clapp as his successor when he retired, although his enthusiasm was not met by the administration of Teachers College, as she was bypassed for the post. Clapp subsequently ran two experimental rural schools in Jefferson County, Kentucky, and in Arthurdale, West Virginia, the latter being a project conceived by Eleanor Roosevelt. She wrote books on education, incorporating pragmatist ideas developed during her time with Dewey, and acted as editor for Progressive Education. Sadly, her work, and influence on Dewey’s work, became neglected, with accounts of the latter’s academic life omitting Clapp altogether, hence the importance of recovering such historically overlooked figures (Seigfried 1996, 47–52).

Lucy Sprague Mitchell, another student of the pragmatists, was influenced not only by Dewey (with whom she developed a life-long intellectual relationship through her parents, and whose classes she went to at Teachers College in 1913), but she also benefited from being exposed to the Harvard pragmatists, including William James, Josiah Royce, George Herbert Palmer, Hugo Münsterberg, and George Santayana. She became the first dean for women at the University of California at Berkeley, while also taking on a faculty position in English. Mitchell sometimes looked after a friend’s child, Polly, whom she studied intensely, and her enthusiasm for seeing Polly develop, issued in a career change toward childhood education. Polly died when she was only four years old, yet undoubtedly she had a profound effect on Mitchell, who took her cue for pragmatist educational theory from the real-life experiences gained with Polly. Thus, although Mitchell had attended several philosophy classes, she had no interest in becoming a philosopher, finding the (male) philosophers she knew eccentric or aloof. In Alice Freeman Palmer, wife of Herbert Palmer, though, she found a role model, and since Alice had been president of Wellesley in an age where women’s education was still a controversial topic, Mitchell followed in her footsteps, as it were, by opting for an administrative career at Berkeley. The pervasive sexism she encountered there, and her growing belief in “public education [as] the most constructive attack on social problems” (Seigfried 1996, 55), when coupled with her emphasis on experience, resulted in the focus on education in the latter part of her life. Notably, Mitchell’s pragmatist educational theory and practice took hold in the Bank Street School (Seigfried  1996,  52 – 57).

A student of George Herbert Mead, Jessie Taft, is another forgotten pragmatist figure recently ‘unearthed’ by contemporary scholars engaged in recovering women pragmatist work. Taft completed, in 1913, her doctoral thesis, which formed possibly “the first Ph.D. dissertation in philosophy on the women’s movement” (Seigfried 1993b, 215). Entitled “The Woman Movement from the Point of View of Social Consciousness,” it is remarkably contemporary in tone, and appears to anticipate several important issues and conceptual ideas debated by feminist theorists today. Taft argues that women are hampered in both the domestic and public spheres, having control over neither, ultimately resulting in a disconnected and under-developed self with limited social awareness. Drawing parallels with the labour movement, she thus explains the task of the women’s movement as a twofold venture, consisting first of the need to “make women conscious of their relations to a social order, second, to show society its need of conscious womanhood” (Taft 225). She notes that the situation of women is not only inhibitive for women’s selfhood, but also for men’s, and for the “growth,” as Dewey would term it, of society more generally. Writes Taft:

This stage of social development [wherein we shall have conditions favourable for the control of social problems] can never be reached as long as any large class of people, such as its women, are permitted, encouraged, or forced to exist in an unreal world wilfully maintained for that purpose. Nor will the selves of men, in so far as they are formed by their relations to women, ever reach the full possibilities of selfhood while women remain only partially self-conscious. (Taft 229)

Taft extends Mead’s theory of selfhood, and couples it with a tripartite categorisation of consciousness, rejecting individualism in favour of a social reading of selfhood in the context of feminists’ attempts to institute suffrage. Sadly, Taft’s own life story appears to be a stark reminder of the rather slow progress made by the movement she theorised, as it took over two decades for her to find a full-time post after completing her doctorate (Seigfried 1993b, 215 – 218).

Discriminatory and sexist treatment like this undoubtedly impacted upon the lives and work of many of the early women pragmatists. Universities were often loath to recognise women on a par with men, either as students or as faculty members. Several women students of pragmatists, though, found in their teachers male philosophers supportive of women’s education, who repeated their courses at attached women’s colleges (Radcliffe in the case of Harvard), or who committed themselves to coeducation. Unfortunately, such progressiveness was not always matched by the university hierarchy, and women scholars struggled to gain the legitimate and deserved recognition for their work. For instance, Mary Whiton Calkins completed with distinction her Ph.D. in 1895 under the supervision of Hugo Münsterberg. However, she never received her doctorate from Harvard, despite undertaking studies there. She was asked, instead, to take the degree from Radcliffe, but as Seigfried explains, since Radcliffe only provided undergraduate courses, acceptance of such an intermediary would have legitimised Harvard’s continued discriminatory treatment of women. Calkins went on to become a professor at Wellesley, and was the first woman president of both the American Psychological Association and the American Philosophical Association (Seigfried 1993c,  230 – 231).

Given the off-putting nature of such overt sexism, it is not surprising to find that several women pragmatists either left universities, or had only a limited direct involvement with them. Seigfried, for instance, cites Lucy Sprague Mitchell’s letter, in which she details her reaction to encountering misogyny at Berkeley. Mitchell states that she was shocked upon realising “that most of the faculty thought of women frankly as inferior beings” (Seigfried 1996, 54). While many women scholars tried to remain within the university system, one can understand how such a pervasive sexism may pose a deterrent to a continued career in academia. On the other hand, several women pragmatists felt confined not only by the hostility of university administrations and faculty members, but by the largely theoretical nature of academic work. Since pragmatism emphasises experience as a counter-weight to theory, and insists upon the mutually reinforcing and informing nature of experience and theory, many women pragmatists found the university setting constricting.

Thus, Mitchell notes of Jane Addams, that she became for her “a symbol of the ‘real’ world – a world of work and of people that I longed to reach but could not” (Seigfried 1996, 56). The “real world” referred to by Mitchell, although promoted through initiatives such as the Lab School, remained, to too large an extent, inaccessible for pragmatists such as Mitchell, and they therefore sought actual experience outside of the realm of academia. It is for this reason, also, that the most prominent woman pragmatist, Jane Addams, kept her focus on the “real world” outside of universities, despite giving lectures at the University of Chicago. The next section explores the life and thought of this influential pragmatist in greater detail, as her work and impact merits further elucidation, if women’s role in the development of pragmatism is to be fully understood. It is important though, to note in sum, that pragmatism is not confined to universities, but is very much a philosophy inspired by and concerned with “the real world,” whether this is found in academia or outside of it.

b. Jane Addams

Jane AddamsJane Addams epitomises this quest, typical of many women pragmatists, for a life in the “real world” wherein pragmatist insights can be gained and fed into theory production. Thus, Addams’s writings are replete with quotidian experiences and scenes taken from Hull House.  Many of her essays and books concentrate on the personal lives of immigrant neighbours she came to know through her settlement activities, and her diverse intellectual influences lead to a polyvocality rarely seen in more traditional philosophical writing. The voices of her neighbours, novelists, poets, Greek dramatists, and philosophers, mingle in her texts, problematising lived experiences and drawing important theoretical insights therefrom.

The topics she discusses are far from typical Victorian era academic fare. Prostitution, juvenile delinquency, world peace, folk tales, and democracy are just some of the themes covered in her extensive philosophical output. Perhaps because Addams’s writing is unconventional in content and style, has she been dismissed as a mere practitioner. She is often erroneously viewed as an implementer of the male pragmatists’ ideas, and her philosophical insights are denigrated while she is labelled a social worker rather than a philosopher. Although Addams was simultaneously a social worker, sociologist, political activist, labour mediator, and educator, importantly, she was also a formidable pragmatist thinker. Her multiple roles informed a unique body of work so intimately linked to experience that it is perhaps most quintessentially pragmatist, in that there really is no separation between theory and practice in her work.

The recovery work undertaken by contemporary scholars acknowledges this, and has sought to re-establish Addams as a classical pragmatist who captures the progressive era’s spirit in her very being, by living the principles pragmatism espouses. For although Addams was somewhat of a celebrity in her time, just like many other women pragmatists, she was left out of the philosophical canon, being remembered, instead, as a pacifist or suffragist. Renewed interest in Addams, though, has led to a re-examination of her work, and her impact upon the development of pragmatism is now increasingly recognised. For instance, Dewey and Addams had an intimate intellectual relationship, with Dewey becoming a trustee of Hull House, and visiting there frequently to deliver lectures to the Plato Club, Hull House’s philosophical society. Dewey acknowledged his philosophical indebtedness to Addams, and both thinkers influenced each other mutually, developing pragmatist ideas and theories in tandem. Addams’s close links with the University of Chicago meant that a cross-pollination of ideas between faculty members and Hull House residents was inevitable. Further, owing to the fame she achieved in her lifetime, she was in close correspondence with many influential thinkers, writers, activists, and policy makers beyond the realms of academia and the Chicago settlement.

Addams was a sought-after public speaker, and although she had a steadfast belief in the principles she developed in her work, she never spoke on behalf of those whose interests she defended, but chose to speak with them by engaging in an inclusionary approach to transformation. This, perhaps, most aptly characterises Addams’s conception of the settlement, as she rejected the negative stereotyping of people found in supposedly benevolent charity work, and instead opted for understanding and supporting her neighbours through what we would today call a ‘bottom-up’ approach to activism. Hence, Addams understands the settlement as:

an experimental effort to aid in the solution of the social and industrial problems which are engendered by the modern conditions of life in a great city...It is an attempt to relieve, at the same time, the overaccumulation at one end of society and the destitution at the other; but it assumes that this overaccumulation and destitution is most sorely felt in the things that pertain to social and educational advantages. (Addams 2008, 83)

While Hull House counteracted such ‘overaccumulation at one end of society’ through various initiatives – establishing educational courses, art classes, child care and sports facilities, or rallying against corruption in politics and providing space for labour organising – Addams remained non-committed in ideological terms.

She rejected divisiveness and although she supported several causes, she avoided adopting specific labels. In her autobiographical book Twenty Years at Hull House, she wrote of the settlement, that “from its very nature it can stand for no political or social propaganda. It must, in a sense, give the warm welcome of an inn to all such propaganda, if perchance one of them be found an angel” (Addams 2008, 83). This non-ideological attitude was often criticised by commentators, as was, ironically, the one ideology she did assume, that is, pacifism. Addams was an outspoken opponent of war, and campaigned against the U.S.’s entry into World War I. For this, she was vilified and her work was frequently maligned. In later years, though, her activism for peace, which included the co-founding of the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom (WILPF), was recognised, and she was awarded the 1931 Nobel Peace Prize.

Throughout Addams’s varied career, during which she gradually moved from settlement work to more global activism, she developed a pragmatism, which was intimately concerned with instituting progress, particularly for the politically, socially and economically marginalised. Since women made up a large part of this constituency, her work represents a formidable example of early feminist-pragmatism. Addams explicitly addressed the concerns of women, which were largely neglected by the male pragmatists, and her texts provide invaluable insights informed by the gendered nature of our experiences. Her attribution of moral import to pluralism in democracy (Addams 2002a), her cosmopolitanism (Addams 2002b), her meliorism (Addams 2005), her quest for knowledge through ‘perplexities’ (Addams 2002a), her understanding of memory in terms of its transformative potential of past and future (Addams 2002c), and her interpretation of art and beauty as relief from the dreariness of industrial life (Addams 2008), form just some of the significant theoretical contributions to a pragmatist philosophy, which was both lived and intellectually conceived. As such, Addams constitutes a towering figure in the history of feminist-pragmatism and of classical pragmatism more generally.

c. Early Feminist-Pragmatist Legacy

Owing largely to Charlene Haddock Seigfried’s seminal work Pragmatism and Feminism, contemporary feminist-pragmatists have managed to unearth hitherto unknown early pragmatist work undertaken by women. Some of these women were not necessarily feminists, nor were they necessarily primarily concerned with theorising the experiences of women. However, their influences have shaped the development of pragmatism itself, and the work of expressly feminist-pragmatists constitutes a particularly rich resource for contemporary feminist-pragmatist theorists. Thus, the writings of early women pragmatists are being utilised by theorists today, and increased interest in their work has resulted not only in several updated biographies and a reissuing of their texts, but also in new, original books and articles engaging with their arguments and theories (see for example, Hamington, 2010 and Fischer 2009).

Importantly, some of the themes contemporary thinkers are concerned with, are also topics previously explored by their feminist-pragmatist forerunners. For instance, Judy D. Whipps (2006) draws upon the work of Emily Greene Balch to trace the thematic continuity between Balch’s priorities and the priorities of contemporary feminist peace activists. Balch was a pragmatist thinker, economist, and social scientist. Like Addams, she was a co-founder of the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom (WILPF), and was awarded the Nobel Peace Prize fifteen years after Addams had received that same honour. Balch’s activism similarly grew out of her engagement with the settlement movement, although being involved with the foundation of Denison House in 1982, she re-entered academia after two years to continue her studies both in the United States and in Europe. Together with Addams and Alice Hamilton she wrote Women at The Hague (Addams et al.2003), an account of the 1915 International Congress of Women.

Although employed by Wellesley as a professor, her peace activism hampered her academic career, and she subsequently focused solely on advocating for peace. She championed anti-colonialism, being largely responsible for a critical report on United States de facto control over Haiti (1927), criticised unjust trade relations between more or less powerful states, and sought U.N. control of all military bases. Her theoretical work enshrined a cosmopolitanism and pluralism reminiscent of Addams’s ‘bottom-up’ conceptualisation of meliorism. She held that shared work could facilitate shared understanding, arguing that “cooperation in practical, technical tasks is one of the best ways of learning the indispensable art of getting along with one another” (Whipps 126). Importantly, Balch is a predecessor to contemporary women peace activists, who can learn from her pragmatist understandings of international affairs in terms of cooperation and the desire to realise progressive change (Whipps 123 – 130).

Several early women pragmatists seem to anticipate contemporary feminist debates, and formulate concepts, which are part and parcel of today’s theoretical vocabulary. Thus, in “Follett’s Pragmatist Ontology of Relations: Potentials for a Feminist Perspective on Violence,” Amrita Banerjee (2008) makes use of Mary Parker Follett’s work to shed light on the ontological implications of gendered violence. Follett became a leading management consultant in her time, however, she also developed pragmatist theories on politics in works such as The New State (1998). Follett distinguished between ‘power-over’ and ‘power-with’, arguing that “whereas power usually means power-over...it is possible to develop the conception of power-with, a jointly developed power, a co-active, not a coercive power” (Banerjee 4). While Banerjee employs this reconceptualisation of power in terms of ‘power-over’ and ‘power-with’ in an analysis of gender based violence, it is easy to see how this hybrid understanding of power has become engrained in our contemporary minds, and has been utilised by feminist theorists, peace activists, and others, to advance a more sophisticated comprehension of a variety of political issues.

In this sense, then, early women pragmatists, even when not explicitly feminist, can be engaged by current feminist thinkers in feminist causes and can contribute to critical feminist-pragmatist reflections on problems facing women and men in today’s world. Also, the thematic continuity between early and later women pragmatists – whether they wrote on democracy, international governance, peace, education, community activism, gender roles, or employment – indicates the abundance of theoretical material which can be fruitfully mined by contemporary theorists. Thus, the writings of Addams, Balch, Follett, Gilman, Mitchell, Young, Clapp and Taft constitute a rich legacy for the feminist-pragmatists of today.

2.Contemporary Feminist-Pragmatism

Beyond the conduciveness of early women pragmatist work to contemporary feminist projects, theorists and activists of today also draw upon the work of the male pragmatists. This is because pragmatism, in general, is a tradition which rejects many of the philosophical claims feminists reject, and promotes many of the objectives feminists promote. Due to the extensive proliferation of feminist theory, particularly over the latter part of the twentieth century and into the present, feminists are in a position to bring sophisticated philosophical insights and concepts to bear upon early pragmatist thought. Indeed, many feminist theoretical analyses, which may have developed in isolation from pragmatism, nonetheless find resonance in pragmatist theory and practice. For example, there is a large body of work, in feminist philosophy, on embodiment. Feminists have argued that physicality is often denigrated in our societies, and is theorised as being subservient or inferior to intellect. Pragmatists, such as John Dewey, have rejected this demarcation of body and mind, and oppose the devaluing of the former in favour of the latter. Contemporary feminist-pragmatists, like Shannon Sullivan (2001), have therefore been able to use pragmatist and feminist work to advance feminist-pragmatist theories of embodiment.

Dewey calls such false axiological bifurcations as mind/body dualisms, and he identifies several of these in the history of philosophical thought. Self/environment, change/stasis, universal/particular, thought/practice─all of these are distinctions, which erroneously create oppositionals, with one oppositional being valued at the expense of the other. Feminists have similarly found such dualisms in philosophical theories, and have shown that they hold distinctly gendered implications. Thus, connections have been made between the philosophical denigration of the body in favour of the mind, and the devaluation of women’s bodies in particular (owing to the common identification of womanhood in bodily terms). Feminists can therefore use pragmatist understandings of dualisms to counter the traditional juxtaposition of body and mind, and in conjunction with feminist theoretical insights, can argue against the subjugation of gendered bodies in particular.

Another dualism prevalent in much philosophical thought, is reason/emotion. As several feminist-pragmatists have pointed out, both pragmatists and feminists reject this dualism and recognise the importance of feeling and the affective in our daily interactions with people, while accepting the political potential this may also hold for our societies. Indeed, the feminist re-valuing of the affective has issued in a branch of feminist moral philosophy called care ethics. Charles Sanders Peirce’s work recognises the emotional or felt dimension of thought (Peirce 1934-1963), while William James emphasises the centrality of care and sympathy particularly in women’s lives (James 1983, see also Seigfried 1996). Pragmatist philosophy and care ethics can be mutually conducive bodies of work, allowing feminist-pragmatists to reconceptualise the relationship between reason and emotion, and redressing the skewed favouring of one over the other. Several feminist-pragmatists have done precisely that, by theorising the affective in the context of care ethics and pragmatist thought (see Leffers, 1993; Pappas, 1993; and Seigfried, 1989).

Many feminists, including care ethicists, critique a dominant view of selfhood, which assumes us to be isolated, self-sufficient beings. This abstract individualism attendant in much philosophical theorising is also, however, undermined by pragmatist thinkers. George Herbert Meade, for instance, problematises the development of selves in community with other human beings, and explicitly discusses what is later to become a central theme in feminist theory, that is, self as it exists in relation to the other (1934). Pragmatists reject a clear opposition between self and society, and argue instead that true selfhood can only take place through community. Hence, for pragmatists and feminists, the self needs to be understood with regard to its relationality. This conception of the self and its interdependent existence with others is important both for ontology, and for moral and political philosophy, as our dependency, our sociality, and our power to transform each other hold important implications for debates on gender and liberalism, communitarianism, and libertarianism, amongst others. Thus, theorists such as Judy Whipps (2004) have developed feminist-pragmatist models for comprehending selves in the context of their shared existences with others.

Feminists and pragmatists also oppose the practice/thought dualism alongside the closely related experience/theory dualism. As noted earlier, for many women pragmatists of the classical period, the university setting stifled any real, sustained engagement with experience. This is why they often practiced pragmatism outside of academia, where experience could be focused on more intensively, thereby allowing the reciprocal relationship between theory and practice to really take hold. Today, as well, pragmatism exists outside of the academic world, and this is perhaps why it is such an attractive philosophy for feminists, as feminism also usually entails activism outside of the academy. The intimate relationship between practice and thought is also significant in terms of education, and the early pragmatists, such as Dewey and Addams, developed educational theories which captured the symbiotic nature of doing and thinking (Dewey, 2008 and Addams 2008). These insights are still relevant today, and have epistemological import, especially when coupled with the pragmatist prioritising of pluralism.

For pragmatists, diversity leads to vibrant democracies, however, it also enriches knowledge. Given that women’s knowledge is often dismissed, feminism is fundamentally akin to pragmatism in this respect, as it promotes inclusionary epistemologies, which stem directly from our gendered life experiences. Feminists seek the legitimisation of women’s knowledge through epistemological models, such as standpoint theory, which recognise women’s unique experiences knowable only to them. Pragmatists also reject a bird’s eye view of the world, wherein objective knowledge can be achieved by appealing to singular accounts of the Truth, but instead propose that there are multiple truths. Dewey, for example, views truth as a working hypothesis, which we’ve come, for the time being, to agree upon, but which needs to be continuously reviewed (Dewey, 1986). Pragmatism thus anticipates the post-modern critique of totalising narratives of truth, without falling into an inescapable relativism. Feminism, which has had to come to terms with its own exclusions – in terms of omitting the experiences and attendant truths of women of colour, for example – can utilise pragmatist epistemological insights to its advantage to promote pluralist and egalitarian epistemologies. Several contemporary feminists have proceeded in such a manner to devise feminist-pragmatist approaches to knowledge, building upon pragmatist explanations of , for example, the impetus for thought provided by Addams’s ‘perplexities’ or Peirce’s ‘irritation of doubt’ (see Rooney, 1993). Shannon Sullivan has also developed a feminist-pragmatist standpoint theory with which to overcome the “false dilemma of objectivism and relativism” (Sullivan 211).

The early pragmatists were ardent defenders of democracy, although they eschewed labels and the blind adoption of ideologies. This is due to pragmatism’s meliorism, but also to pragmatism’s view of the world and its inhabitants as constantly evolving. Hence, the dualism of change/stasis is undercut in pragmatist philosophy, as continuity and stability exist simultaneously with dynamism and change. Precisely because metaphysically everything is in the making, should we avoid rigidly clinging to certain structures, as these should not retain their current form. Thus, Dewey recognised that American society had changed immensely since democracy was instituted, and yet, the same out-dated ideas seemed to underpin democracy several hundred years later. For Dewey, this was hugely destructive to the values and aims democracy sought to promote, and he repeatedly criticised the abstract individualism and false universalism attendant in liberal theory, which were originally, perhaps, appropriate, but which hampered the further development of democracy into a more modern ethico-political system (Dewey, 1985). In her book The Task of Utopia, Erin McKenna appropriates Dewey’s adaptive ontology, and draws upon feminist utopian literature to advance a “process model of utopia” which counters the “end-state model of utopia” by positing utopia as always in the making (2001). Contemporary feminist-pragmatists have also developed and extended pragmatist theorising on democracy, and have built upon pragmatism’s espousal of pluralism and the political implications of the often problematic nature of selves in community with others (see Singer 1999, Greene 1999, and  Sullivan 2006).

Finally, it should be noted that there has been feminist engagement with neo-pragmatist philosophers, particularly with Richard Rorty. However, this has sometimes been controversial, as Rorty’s philosophy has been criticised for undermining some of pragmatism’s core principles, including its social and political commitments (Brodsky, 1982). Contemporary feminist-pragmatists have thus critically evaluated Rorty and his post-linguistic turn interpretation of pragmatism, while Rorty, on the other hand, has explicitly problematised feminism’s relationship to deconstructionism and pragmatism (1993). Themes covered in this neo-pragmatist and feminist exchange include masculinist ideology, the rejection of language over experience (Kaufman-Osborn, 1993), and the functioning of power (Bickford, 1993).

3. Conclusion

Feminist-pragmatists of the 21st century benefit from the confluence of feminism and pragmatism, being able to draw upon both feminist and pragmatist theory and practice. Early feminist-pragmatist work, of course, already exhibits a convergence of feminist and pragmatist insights, hence the wealth of material available for ‘mining’ by contemporary feminist-pragmatists. Given that the recovery of women pragmatist work is still ongoing, it is likely that such feminist-pragmatist resources will continue to grow, as more and more women pragmatists are rescued from historical oblivion. In the meantime, though, pragmatists provide the inspiration for many feminist-pragmatists writing on themes dear to the hearts of their feminist-pragmatist predecessors, bringing contemporary feminist concepts and debates to bear upon pragmatist lessons from metaphysics, epistemology, political philosophy, ethics, and philosophy of education.

The philosophical kinship between pragmatism and feminism can also be attributed to both their liberatory aspirations. Early pragmatists, such as Addams, Dewey, and Balch, were part of progressive movements for equality for women and people of colour, for world peace, for increased access to quality education, and for an end to political corruption and economic greed. Contemporary feminist-pragmatists will likely continue pursuing some of these progressive goals, while also trying to achieve new goals arising from the present historical context.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Early Pragmatist and Feminist-Pragmatist Sources

  • Addams, J., Twenty Years at Hull House, Dover, New York, 2008.
  • Addams, J., Writings on Peace, (edited by Fischer, M. & Whipps, J. D.), Continuum London, 2005.
  • Addams, J., Democracy and Social Ethics, University of Illinois Press, Urbana and Chicago, 2002a.
  • Addams, J., Peace and Bread in Time of War, University of Illinois Press, Urbana and Chicago, 2002b.
  • Addams, J., The Long Road of Woman’s Memory, University of Illinois Press, Urbana and Chicago, 2002c.
  • Addams, J. et al., Women at The Hague: The International Congress of Women and its Results, University of Illinois Press, Urbana and Chicago, 2003.
  • Balch, E. G. (ed.), Occupied Haiti, New York, Garland Publishing, 1972.
  • Dewey, John, Democracy and Education in John Dewey: The Middle Works, Vol. 9: 1916, Boydston (ed.), Southern Illinois University Press, Carbondale and Edwardsville,    2008
  • Dewey, John, Logic: The Theory of Inquiry in John Dewey: The Later Works, Vol. 12: 1938, Boydston (ed.), Southern Illinois University Press, Carbondale and Edwardsville, 1986.
  • Dewey, John, The Public and its Problems in John Dewey: The Later Works, Vol. 2: 1925 –1927,Boydston (ed.), Southern Illinois University Press, Carbondale and      Edwardsville, 1985.
  • Elshtain, J. B. (ed.), The Jane Addams Reader, Basic Books, New York, 2002.
  • Follett, M. P., The New State: Group Organization the Solution of Popular Government, Pennsylvania State University Press, University Park, PA, 1998.
  • James, W., Talks to Teachers on Psychology in The Works of William James, Burkhard et. al., (ed.), Harvard University Press, Cambridge,1983.
  • Meade, G. H., Mind, Self and Society: From the Perspective of  Social Behaviorist, Morris (ed.), University of Chicago Press, Chicago, 1934.
  • Mitchell, Lucy Sprague, Two Lives: The Story of Wesley Clair Mitchell and Myself, Simon and Schuster, New York, 1953.
  • Peirce, C. S., Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, Hartshorne et al. (ed.), Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, Cambridge, 1934-1963.
  • Taft, J., “The Woman Movement as Part of the Larger Social Situation” [excerpt from doctoral thesis “The Woman Movement from the Point of View of Social Consciousness”],Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.

b. Contemporary Feminist-Pragmatist Sources:

i. Introductions or Overviews

  • Duran, J., “The Intersection of Pragmatism and Feminism,” Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.
  • Miller, M., “Feminism and Pragmatism: On the Arrival of a ‘Ministry of Disturbance, a     Regulated Source of Annoyance, a Destroyer of Routine, an Underminer of Complacency’”,The Monist, Vol. 75, No. 4, October 1992.
  • Radin, M. J., “The Pragmatist and the Feminist”, Southern California Law Review, Vol. 63, 1990.
  • Seigfried, C. H., Pragmatism and Feminism: Reweaving the Social Fabric, University of Chicago Press, London, 1996.
  • Seigfried, C. H., “Shared Communities of Interest: Feminism and Pragmatism”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993a.
  • Seigfried, C. H., “The Missing Perspective: Feminist Pragmatism”, Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, Vol. 27, No. 4, Fall 1991.
  • Seigfried, C. H., “Where Are All the Pragmatist Feminists?” Hypatia, Vol. 6, No. 2, Summer 1991.

ii. More Advanced or Specialised Sources

  • Aboulafia, M., “Was George Herbert Mead a Feminist?”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.
  • Banerjee, A., “Follett’s Pragmatist Ontology of Relations: Potentials for a Feminist Perspective on Violence,” Journal of Speculative Philosophy, Vol. 22, No. 1, 2008.
  • Bickford, S., “Why We Listen to Lunatics: Antifoundational Theories and Feminist Politics”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993, pp. 104 – 124.
  • Brodsky, G., “Rorty’s Interpretation of Pragmatism”, Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, Vol. 18, No. 4, pp. 311 – 337.
  • Dewey, Jane, “Biography of Dewey” in The Philosophy of John Dewey, Schilpp et al. (ed.), La Salle, IL, Open Court, 1989, pp. 3 – 46.
  • Deegan, M. J., “‘Dear Love, Dear Love’: Feminist Pragmatism and the Chicago Female World of Love and Ritual”, Gender & Society, Vol. 10, No. 5, October 1996.
  • Fischer, M. et al., Jane Addams and the Practice of Democracy, University of Illinois Press, Urbana and Chicago, 2009.
  • Fischer, M., “Addams’s Internationalist Pacifism and the Rhetoric of Maternalism”, NWSA Journal, Vol. 18, No. 3, Fall 2006.
  • Gatens-Robinson, E., “Dewey and the Feminist successor Science Project”, Transactions of  the Charles S. Peirce Society, Vol. 27, No. 4, Fall 1991.
  • Greene, J. M., Deep Democracy: Community, Diversity and Transformation, Rowman & Littlefield, Lanham, MA, 1999.
  • Hamington, M., Feminist Interpretations of Jane Addams, Pennsylvania State University Press, University Park, PA, 2010.
  • Hamington, M., The Social Philosophy of Jane Addams, Urbana and Chicago: University of Illinois Press, 2009.
  • Heldke, L., “John Dewey and Evelyn Fox Keller: A Shared Epistemological Tradition”, Hypatia, Vol. 2, No. 3, Fall 1987.
  • Kaufman-Osborn, T. V., “Teasing Feminist Sense from Experience”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993, pp. 124 – 144.
  • Jannack, M., Feminist Interpretations of Richard Rorty, Penn State University Press, University Park, 2010.
  • Leffers, “Pragmatists Jane Addams and John Dewey Inform the Ethic of Care”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.
  • Mahowald, M. B., “A Majority Perspective: Feminine and Feminist Elements in American Philosophy”, Cross Currents, Vol. 36, Winter 1986.
  • McKenna, E., The Task of Utopia: A Pragmatist and Feminist Perspective, Rowman & Littlefield, Lanham, MA, 2001.
  • Moen, M. K., “Peirce’s Pragmatism as Resource for Feminism”, Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, Vol. 27, No. 4, Fall 1991.
  • Pappas, G. F., “Dewey and Feminism: The Affective and Relationships in Dewey’s Ethics”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.
  • Rorty, R., “Feminism, Ideology, and Deconstruction: A Pragmatist View”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993, pp. 96 – 103.
  • Rooney, P., “Feminist-Pragmatist Revisionings of Reason, Knowledge, and Philosophy,”  Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.
  • Schilpp et al. (ed.), The Philosophy of John Dewey, Open Court, La Salle, IL, 1989.
  • Seigfried, C. H. (ed.), Feminist Interpretations of John Dewey, Pennsylvania State University Press, University Park, PA, 2002.
  • Seigfried, C. H. (ed.), Hypatia: Special Issue on Feminism and Pragmatism, Vol. 8, No. 3, Spring 1993.
  • Seigfried, C. H., “Introduction to Jessie Taft, ‘The Woman Movement from the Point of   View of Social Consciousness’”, Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993b.
  • Seigfried, C. H., “1895 Letter from Harvard Philosophy Department,” Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993c.
  • Seigfried, C. H., “Pragmatism, Feminism, and Sensitivity to Context” in Who Cares? Theory, Research, and Educational Implication of the Ethic of Care, Brabeck (ed.), Praeger, New York, 1989.
  • Singer, B., Pragmatism, Rights and Democracy, Fordham University Press, New York, 1999.
  • Sullivan, S., Revealing Whiteness: The Unconscious Habits of Racial Privilege, Indiana University Press, Bloomington and Indianapolis, 2006.
  • Sullivan, S., “The Need for Truth: Toward a Pragmatist- Feminist Standpoint Theory” in Feminist Interpretations of John Dewey, Seigfried (ed.), Pennsylvania State University Press, University Park, PA, 2002.
  • Sullivan, S., Living Across and Through Skins: Transactional Bodies, Pragmatism, and Feminism, Indiana University Press, Bloomington and Indianapolis, 2001.
  • Upin, J., “Charlotte Perkins Gilman: Instrumentalism beyond Dewey,” Hypatia, Vol. 8, No. 2, Spring 1993.
  • Whipps, J. D., “The Feminist Pacifism of Emily Greene Balch, Nobel Peace Laureate,” NWSA Journal, Vol. 18, No. 3, Fall 2006.
  • Whipps, J. D., “Jane Addams’s Social Thought as a Model for a Pragmatist-Feminist Communitarianism,” Hypatia, Vol. 19, No. 2, Spring 2004.
  • West, C., The American Evasion of Philosophy: A Genealogy of Pragmatism, University of Wisconsin Press, Madison, 1989.


Author Information

Clara Fischer
Email: fischecc@tcd.ie
Trinity College Dublin


Although deconstruction has roots in Martin Heidegger’s concept of Destruktion, to deconstruct is not to destroy.  Deconstruction is always a double movement of simultaneous affirmation and undoing.  It started out as a way of reading the history of metaphysics in Heidegger and Jacques Derrida, but was soon applied to the interpretation of literary, religious, and legal texts as well as philosophical ones, and was adopted by several French feminist theorists as a way of making clearer the deep male bias embedded in the European intellectual tradition.

To deconstruct is to take a text apart along the structural “fault lines” created by the ambiguities inherent in one or more of its key concepts or themes in order to reveal the equivocations or contradictions that make the text possible.  For example, in “Plato’s Pharmacy,” Derrida deconstructs Socrates’ criticism of the written word, arguing that it not only suffers from internal inconsistencies because of the analogy Socrates himself makes between memory and writing, but also stands in stark contrast to the fact that his ideas come to us only through the written word he disparaged (D 61-171).  The double movement here is one of tracing this tension in Plato’s text, and in the traditional reading of that text, while at the same time acknowledging the fundamental ways in which our understanding of the world is dependent on Socrates’ attitude toward the written word.  Derrida points out similar contradictions in philosophical discussions of a preface (by G. W. F. Hegel, D 1-69) and a picture frame (by Immanuel Kant, TP 17-147), which are simultaneously inside and outside the respective works under consideration.

Since the distinction between what is inside the text (or painting) and what is outside can itself be deconstructed according to the same principles, deconstruction is, like Destruktion, an historicizing movement that opens texts to the conditions of their production, their con-text in a very broad sense, including not only the historical circumstances and tradition from which they arose, but also the conventions and nuances of the language in which they were written and the details of their authors’ lives.  This generates an effectively infinite complexity in texts that makes any deconstructive reading necessarily partial and preliminary.

Table of Contents

  1. Destruktion
  2. Deconstruction
    1. Early Formulations
    2. Literary Deconstruction
    3. Contentions and Confrontations
    4. Later Versions
  3. Feminist Deconstruction
  4. References and Further Readings
    1. References
    2. Additional Readings

1. Destruktion

Heidegger’s use of the word Destruktion suffers from the same problem as Edmund Husserl’s use of Intentionalität. Neither is an ordinary German word; both were borrowed from Latin almost as neologisms to express a concept their creators perceived as relatively new to the philosophical domain, only to have the words become confused with their more common cognates when translated into French or English.  The usual German word for “destruction” is “Zerstörung”, but Heidegger’s concept of Destruktion is also closely related to Abbau or dismantling.  Derrida uses the word deconstruction to capture both German terms. (EO 86-6).

In Being and Time, Heidegger says that the purpose of Destruktion is to “arrive at those primordial experiences in which we achieved our first ways of determining the nature of Being—the ways which have guided us ever since” (BT 44).  This is the double gesture referred to above, one that takes apart the European traditions and in so doing finds the basic understanding of Being beneath its surface. This goal separates Destruktion from deconstruction, not because deconstruction is purely negative, but because it has no fixed endpoint or goal.  Deconstruction is always an on-going process because the constantly shifting nature of language means that no final meaning or interpretation of a text is possible.  Subsequent ages, grounded in a different language and different ways of life, will always see something different in a text as they deconstruct it in the context of the realities with which they live.  What is meant by “the written word”, for example, has already evolved substantially since Derrida wrote “Plato’s Pharmacy” due to the explosion in electronic media.  All deconstruction can reveal are temporary and more or less adequate truths, not more primordial or deeper ones.  For Heidegger, on the other hand, the “primordial experiences” of Being revealed through Destruktion result in a single interpretation that offers a more authentic alternative to philosophy’s misunderstanding of the temporality and historicality of human existence.

Temporality and historicality are essential components of Dasein, Heidegger’s term for human existence, because it is “thrown projection”, that is, an entity necessarily oriented toward an unknown future, but always based on a past for which it is not itself fully responsible and which it can never fully know.  Time, then, is not only a category of experience (as in Kant), but the very core of our existence. As beings in a present moment are  defined in terms of a past that creates our possibilities and a future into which we project them.  On a larger scale, this temporality of Dasein (as opposed to Hegelian Spirit) is what creates history; our ability to project forward and interpret backwards not only the circumstances of our lives, but also those of the entire social world to which we belong.  For Heidegger, Destruktion of the traditions in that social world can lead us back to a past that can be re-interpreted in ways that reveal the deeper understanding of Being hidden in the earliest texts of the European tradition; it  can offer ways to project a different, more authentic future for Dasein based on the new way of seeing the past.

2. Deconstruction

a. Early Formulations

As already noted, deconstruction differs from Destruktion in that it has no fixed or expected endpoint or map, but is rather a potentially infinite process.  Although obviously a critical tool, it also lacks the sense, evident in Heidegger, that the text to be deconstructed is part of how European thought has somehow gone wrong and needs correction.  This is because deconstruction rejects both the idea that there is a fixed series of eras (ancient, medieval, modern) in European history that mark a downward path, and the idea that there is some determinate way in which that path might be reversed, by a re-interpretation of early Greek philosophy.  Rather, Derrida insists that what he deconstructs are texts that he “loves” (EO 87) and they  are vital parts of our intellectual world, with a view to revealing their underlying complexities and hidden contradictions.  He does not seek to undo Kant, for example, or interpret his writings in ways closer to Derrida’s own vision of what philosophy should be, but rather shows us the ways in which Kant both changes and continues the metaphysical tradition, as well as the ways in which Kant’s texts undo themselves along the same “fault lines” that have undermined that tradition throughout its history.

In 1967, Derrida offered this definition:

To ‘deconstruct’ philosophy, thus, would be to think—in the most faithful, interior way—the structured genealogy of philosophy’s concepts, but at the same time to determine—from a certain exterior that is unqualifiable or unnameable by philosophy—what this history has been able to dissimulate or forbid, making itself into a history by means of this. . .motivated repression (P 6).

What is outside of, or excluded from the realm dominated by the philosophical tradition, although unnamed in it, provides a vantage point and a key with which to find the flaws and lacunae that domination seeks to hide.  The opposition between the spoken and written word in Plato, the text and its introduction in Hegel, the painting and its frame in Kant belong to a series of oppositions (good/evil, mind/body, male/female, center/margin, necessary/contingent, and so forth .) that run though and in many ways structure the European philosophical tradition.  Each of these pairs is also a hierarchy meant to exclude both the non-dominant member of the pair (the body, the female, the margin, the contingent) and anything outside the opposition (the ambiguous, the borderline, the hybrid) from the philosophical realm.  These hierarchical oppositions, in turn, create the basis for political hierarchy and social domination (male/female, freeman/slave, propertied/landless, Christian/other, citizen/immigrant), power differentials that motivate the repression to which Derrida refers. This is why deconstruction denies the possibility of some pre-Socratic “primordial experience” of Being to be found through dismantling the metaphysical tradition which could then solve the problems that tradition has created, because that experience, too, would be subject to deconstruction along these same lines.

What deconstruction reveals, among other things, is that the repression that is necessary for creating a history of philosophy is in large part a repression of what philosophy itself cannot control, of what escapes the grasp of philosophy while being part of it.  The fault lines that deconstruction follows are the traces left inside philosophy by what it must define as exterior to it in order to be philosophy.  Derrida’s early work connects these fault lines to what is represented by the written word:  our inability to control or limit the meaning that might be given to our words because of the historical development of language, the ambiguity of linguistic meaning, and the ability of written text to be excerpted, reproduced and read in contexts we can neither imagine nor control (as opposed, supposedly, to the immediate and limited context of the spoken word).  This is why any text can be deconstructed (even Friedrich Nietzsche’s fragmentary message “I have forgotten my umbrella” in Spurs), but canonical texts (Plato, Kant, Hegel, later Heidegger himself) offer the richest and most productive grounds for deconstruction.  We learn more about ourselves by seeing the traces of a fear of absolute loss that motivate the Aufhebung in Hegel’s texts, than we might from finding the same anxiety in the writing of someone whose influence on European philosophy (and politics) has been less profound.

As an example of deconstruction here, however, it seems advisable to choose a text closer to Nietzsche’s umbrella, than Hegel’s phenomenology of Spirit.  The Truth in Painting takes its title from a letter in which Paul Cézanne tells Émile Bernard, “I owe you the truth in painting [la verité en peinture] and I will tell it to you.”  Derrida points out that the philosophy of language would assert that in writing this, Cézanne must have known what he meant, but in fact the sentence itself has no determinate meaning.  “The truth in painting” escapes and exceeds the boundaries philosophy wants to draw with regard to language because it has at least four meanings, none of which is reducible to any of the others:  1) the truth about truth itself to be found in or through a painting or other work of art, such as the truth Heidegger finds in Van Gogh’s painting of the shoes in “Origin of the Work of Art”; 2) the truth of the painting as painting, that is, how “true to life” it is, how well it succeeds in representing what it is meant to represent; 3) the truth about its object that can be found through the painting, such as when a portrait lays bare the character of its subject; and 4) the truth about painting in the sense of what is true in painting as a human enterprise or art form.

This ambiguity of the French sentence is compounded by the fact that Cézanne promises, not to paint the truth, but to tell or say it in language, thus linking text and painting in a complex nexus of possible meanings and realizations.  There is, and can be, no single meaning of this sentence simply because of the rather ordinary (but untranslatable) French phrase “en peinture”.  As is sometimes the case with the deconstruction of such partial and cryptic texts, Derrida’s target here is not Cézanne’s words themselves, but rather the account of truth and promises (the implicit debt in Cézanne’s “I owe you”) found in contemporary philosophy of language.  Not only does this sentence fail traditional philosophical tests for having a truth value, due to its ambiguity, it also fails to have the conditions of satisfaction, with which more recent philosophy of language hoped to replace those tests and determine whether Cézanne paid his “debt”.  By deconstructing the phrase “the truth in painting”, Derrida hopes to underscore the pragmatic reality that how language functions as a living phenomenon makes it impossible to develop purely formal criteria for identifying or cataloguing true statements.

b. Literary Deconstruction

One notable fact about the reception of deconstruction in the United States was its relatively early acceptance by departments of literature compared to departments of philosophy.  Undoubtedly , there are several reasons for this, but one may be that, as Geoffrey Hartman notes, “Deconstructive criticism does not present itself as a novel enterprise” because the ambiguity and contextuality, the interplay of the spoken and written word, that deconstruction emphasizes in philosophical texts are both more obvious and more acknowledged in literary ones.  At the same time, deconstruction, by foregrounding the fact that “Everything we thought of as spirit, or meaning separable from the letter of the text, remains within an ‘intertextual’ sphere” (DC viii), opened important channels of communication between philosophy and literary studies.

The tools of deconstruction and the sorts of truths they reveal, are similar in both spheres.  The basic strategy is still to follow the trace of a key ambiguity or blind spot through the text to illuminate hierarchical oppositions it relies on and the fault lines along which it can be undone, while still acknowledging its power and importance in European thought.  Ernest Jones’ classic psychoanalytic reading of “Hamlet”, for instance, is deconstructive in that it foregrounds the suppressed patricide in “Julius Caesar” (Shakespeare ignores the fact that Brutus was Caesar’s illegitimate son, thus implying an invariant (beloved-)father/(legitimate-)son pair), and then uses this omission as one key in tracing the Oedipal fault line in the later play.  Here deconstruction yields, not a new meaning to “Hamlet”, as one could say Derrida does in his discussion of prefaces in Hegel, but a new richness to our understanding of Shakespeare’s work.

This highlights the fact that deconstruction plays a different role in literature than in philosophy.  Deconstruction tends to be used in literary theory in arguments between and among theorists about the value of their theories, rather than about the value of the texts under discussion.  One deconstructs Kant to argue with Kant (and perhaps others), but one doesn’t deconstruct Shakespeare to argue with Shakespeare (or, as we saw above, Cézanne to argue with Cézanne).  In addition, literary deconstruction is about texts that are of a different nature than the deconstruction itself, while the deconstruction of one philosophical text results in another philosophical text.  This makes it much clearer in philosophy that deconstructive texts can themselves be, in fact must be, deconstructed.  What literary deconstruction produces, on the other hand, is not itself literature.  This doesn’t mean that literary deconstructions cannot be deconstructed, but that they are not deconstructed in the same way that they are constructed. The context in which such a deconstruction might be carried out, is quite different from the context in which the original deconstructive text was created.  Put another way, literary deconstruction assumes the possibility and reality of literature in at least some sense of the term, whereas deconstruction as a philosophical enterprise questions, at its most basic level, the possibility of philosophy itself.

c. Contentions and Confrontations

Deconstruction has always been engaged in active dialogue with other contemporary approaches to philosophical and literary texts.  The most productive of these conversations have been with those schools of thought that are closest in history and orientation to deconstruction, often sharing its roots in Heidegger’s work.  At the same time, the issues raised in those debates are often similar to those raised by more strident critics completely opposed to the deconstructive enterprise.  A brief summary of some of the most notable confrontations, across more than twenty years, offers an opportunity to consider the most powerful objections to deconstruction, from the end of the 20th century, onwards.

The 1981 conversation between deconstruction (in the person of Derrida) and hermeneutics (in the person of Hans-Georg Gadamer) raises at least two recurrent themes.  The first has already been indirectly discussed—the charge that deconstruction is a negative enterprise.  Gadamer, who speaks of the debate as one between Heidegger’s reading of Nietzsche and Derrida’s, calls deconstruction a “repudiation” of the “language of concepts” that is the legacy of European philosophy (DD 101).  As already noted, however, deconstruction is always a question and a double movement aware of its own debt to the texts it deconstructs, and so never a repudiation.  The second charge is that deconstruction does not allow for the possibility that a word can be redefined or used independently of its traditional metaphysical meaning.  Gadamer raises this point with regard to “understanding” in general, “self-understanding” and “dialectic”, asking why these terms must be considered part of metaphysics when used in the way he uses them.  This argument is weakened, however, by Gadamer’s own reference to “an older wisdom that speaks in living language”, thus affirming the continuing echo of the tradition even in the most carefully redefined or well-intentioned philosophical terms (DD 95-99).

Although directed at postmodernism, the 1990 exchange between major feminist theorists recorded in Feminist Contentions raises some of the same themes as the earlier debate, but also bears directly on the feminist reception of deconstruction in the United States. The feminists who argue here against postmodernism, and by extension against deconstruction, make the case that political action requires a stronger basis than either of these is capable of providing.  Seyla Benhabib, for instance, acknowledges that subjectivity is largely shaped by language and other symbolic structures, but insists that there must remain some sense in which “we are both author and character at once” in our own life histories.  She argues that, in order to be politically effective in the face of women’s sometimes tenuous sense of self and lack of autonomy, feminist philosophy requires a core of irreducible selfhood and agency that deconstruction would deny (FC 21-22).  As Judith Butler points out however, this line of argument precludes the possibility of any “political opposition” to the self as traditionally understood because it allows us no political way to move beyond the traditional metaphysical dualisms (author/character, authority/submission, self/other, autonomy/heteronomy, and back to, e.g.,  male/female) (FC 36).

In her response to Butler, Benhabib emphasizes another recurring theme in debates about deconstruction:  “how can one be constituted by discourse without being determined by it?”  That is, how does the deconstructive understanding of the self as opaque and internally divided provide a starting point for social and political critique (FC 110)?  We have seen, however, that for deconstruction discourse is neither monolithic nor unequivocal, which means that it cannot be fully determinative of the self, either.  The very lack of a permanent, substantial self in the usual sense that Benhabib and others criticize in deconstruction, is at the same time, what creates the possibility of agency outside and beyond the world of fixed essences and meanings envisioned by the philosophical tradition.  (A Cartesian self, Descartes himself tells us in the Meditations, is most free when it has no choice but to follow Reason.)  The complexities here can be seen in the way deconstructive texts themselves often grapple with these same questions about the possibility of personal and political agency (see below) but, as might be expected, come up with no final answer.

The 1993 confrontation between deconstruction and the neo-pragmatism of Richard Rorty raises similar points.  Rorty accuses Derrida of being a humanist in the sense of a follower of the Enlightenment, while he suggests that deconstruction itself diverts attention, at least in the United States, away from real politics (which he later defines as “a matter of pragmatic, short-term reforms and compromises”).  He embraces the deconstructive understanding of language, which he likens to Ludwig Wittgenstein’s, but denies that the consequences of a Wittgensteinian theory of language can be meaningfully applied to the natural sciences.  He argues instead for an empiricist and naturalist position in science, that he sees to be in conflict with the “transcendental” side of deconstruction, that is, its continuing concern with metaphysics and the resultant tendency to see science as a form of metaphysical materialism (DP 14-17).

In response, Derrida accepts some commonality between pragmatism and deconstruction, but defends the asking of the transcendental question and the refusal to do away with metaphysics altogether as a defense against “empiricism, positivism, and psychologism”.  He also refers to his work on the inevitability of violence in the political realm, which counters the tacit optimism in Rorty’s political views (DP 81-83).  Derrida’s argument is that the political state relies on the rule of law, and the rule of law, in turn, relies on the power to punish, that is, on violence, which is therefore the ground of the political state.  His later work on immigration also underscores the dependence of the political state on a sharp and often violent boundary between who has the full rights of  democratic citizenship (“fraternity” in the French context)--that is, the citizen, the landowner, the freeman, all always male--and who does not (aliens, peasants, slaves, women).

Philosophy in a Time of Terror (2003) is not a direct confrontation between deconstruction and Jürgen Habermas’ theory of communicative action, but illustrates the continuity of themes among those critical of deconstruction over the preceding twenty years.  In the context of 9/11, Habermas’ remarks acknowledges the structural violence that underlies the successful societies of what he terms the West. But then questions the “deconstructivist suspicion”, that the model of communication that works reasonably well in everyday situations, will no longer be adequate when we move to larger conversations between political and social groups.  He argues that insisting dialogue is “nothing but” displaced violence obscures the potential of dialogue for ending violence without creating new pretexts for it (PT 35-38).  He similarly objects to the deconstruction of the concept of tolerance as always an exercise of the power to tolerate or not, because the toleration demanded in a democracy is one between equals and thus mutual rather than paternalistic.  He also finds a certain circularity in deconstruction, since it seems to rely on the same universalism, tolerance, and so forth , it seeks to undo.

As already noted, however, this double gesture is itself the essence of deconstruction.  Derrida, for his part, points out that the “major events” that provoke the kind of communication between groups Habermas refers to are more often, if not exclusively, those that directly affect Europe and the United States and not, for instance, an equal number of deaths in Somalia or the Sudan.  What is threatened by 9/11, he goes on, is exactly a particular context of interpretation that has dominated the dialogues between “the West” and its Other, legitimating some forms of violence while disallowing others (PT 92-93).  He reasserts his reading of toleration as an exercise of paternalistic, or specifically religious, power (PT 127).  One does not ask an oppressed group to “tolerate” their oppressors; it is something asked only of those in a position to grant or deny such toleration.  He also questions the possibility of an actually existing democracy, due to the violence of power relations (PT 120), much less the possibility of a democracy in which different groups would be sufficiently equal for toleration to be genuinely mutual.

This last contestation between Habermas and Derrida, is indirect because it was in the form of separate interviews, illustrates three main points.  One, already noted, is the continuity of objections to deconstruction over an extended period of time, primarily focused around issues of the everyday vs. the transcendental (a dualism that deconstruction seeks to undermine) and the political implications of deconstruction.  The second is the lingering impression that these confrontations rely more on contradiction than on real attempts at communication, or even argument.  A method that questions everything, including itself and even the concept of method, as deconstruction does, leaves critics little concrete substance to criticize, except the circularity and the double gesture that deconstruction embraces.  At the same time, the third point to be noted is the increasing engagement of deconstruction with politics after 1989, if not directly in response to these challenges, at least in the context of their persistence.

d. Later Versions

In the 2001 interview about 9/11, Derrida makes a series of statements about the nature of deconstruction that suggest both similarities and differences from his earlier pronouncements.  He defines the deconstructive philosopher as someone “who analyzes and then draws the practical and effective consequences of the relationship between our philosophical heritage and the structure of the still dominant juridico-political system that is so clearly undergoing mutation” (PT 106).  The explicit emphasis on both politics and the pragmatic is as marked as the much more obscure references that were more common thirty years earlier.  At the same time, he emphatically repeats the double gesture of affirming his faith in and allegiance to the idea of an international law that is, like democracy, unrealizable and, again like democracy, undecidable, that is, impossible even to envision without contradiction (PT 115).  Finally, he refers back to “Plato’s Pharmacy” to suggest that the political state is, like writing for Socrates, “at once remedy and poison”, something we can live neither with, because of its inherent violence, nor without, because only the state can protect us from the violence it engenders (PT 124).

Deconstruction retains it critical edge well into the 21st century, even when directed against closely allied texts.  For instance, the 2001 address Derrida gave upon receiving the Theodor Adorno Prize turns back on Adorno himself, specifically on his privileging of the German language even as he champions globalism and a united Europe.  This deconstruction centers in the familiar manner on the untranslatably ambiguous French word fichu (n. neckerchief; adj., lost or done for).  The word appears in French in a letter to Adorno’s wife by Walter Benjamin, who uses it in describing a dream where he speaks of “changing a poem into a fichu” in the first sense (neckerchief or scarf).  This fichu is then associated in the dream with the letter “d”, which Derrida suggests might refer to a name Benjamin used in signing letters, or to his sister or his wife, both named Dora.  Derrida then goes on to point out that “dora” in Greek can mean scorched or scratched skin, hence linking it to fichu in the second sense, but also to Auschwitz and to 9/11, which was Adorno’s birthdate (PM 164-181).  In an excellent example of the deconstruction of a deconstruction, the English translator of this address inserts a footnote here to add that “dor”, meaning gift, is also part of Adorno’s given name, Theodor, “gift of the gods” (PM 203).

Clearly gender plays a central role in the deconstructive process in “Fichus”.  If the fault line or rifts in traditional philosophical texts are the result of attempts to exclude from philosophy what it cannot control, Woman (i.e., Adorno’s wife, Benjamin’s wife and sister, any woman who wears a fichu) will be one of the constant sites of deconstructive undoing.  Death also becomes of increasing importance in deconstruction, as shown in Derrida’s late works focused on the death of the father, the mother, and eventually his own.  In addition to the connection psychoanalysis makes between women and death, both these themes are revealed by deconstruction to be at the root of what the philosophical tradition has always sought to avoid.  Writing, for Socrates, can be deceptive (like a woman), or wander from the source like an illegitimate son (born to such a woman).   Socrates does not say either “woman” or “death”,  but the hatred of writing, deconstruction argues, as of all manifestations of our embodiment in Plato and the tradition he inaugurates, is fundamentally a “motivated repression” of what always exceeds philosophy, the philosopher’s body, his desires, and ultimately his death.

3. Feminist Deconstruction

The connection between deconstruction and feminist readings of the European tradition, although implicit in Derrida’s work since “Plato’s Pharmacy” (1972), was made explicit in a 1981 interview with Christie V. McDonald called “Choreographies”.  Much earlier, however, feminist theorists in France were incorporating deconstructive strategies in their work.  In their 1975 book The Newly Born Woman, for instance, Hélène Cixous and Catherine Clément underscore the series of hierarchical oppositions (good/bad, life/death, day/night, culture/nature, male/female) that provide most, if not all, of the key terms that open a text to a deconstructive reading.  The list, which carries a footnoted reference to Derrida, is not, as we have already seen, an innocent one.  In Plato the pair speech/writing is one central theme; in the ancient Greeks generally, active/passive; in religion God/man, later Christian/Jew; in René Descartes and the moderns mind/body; in colonial or racist ideology Western/Oriental, white/black.  In a further repetition of Derrida’s method, Cixous and Clément’s move is not to reverse these hierarchies, which would only create another system of power.  They seek instead to think in a third way.  This third way is called “bisexuality” here, meaning the refusal to focus on a single sexual organ in favor of undifferentiated pleasures of the flesh (NBW 84-85).  This move to rethink sexuality as part of a deconstructive strategy, drawing on psychoanalysis and anthropological texts such as Marcel Mauss’ “Essay on the Gift”, is a common theme in French feminist deconstruction, also found, for example, in the work of Luce Irigaray and Julia Kristeva (and in later texts by Derrida himself).

Given the importance of Sigmund Freud’s work to this strain of feminist deconstruction, Sarah Kofman’s 1980 book on Freud provides a detailed example of the potential power of this method for feminist thought.  One major fault line she examines is the concept of “penis envy”, a phenomenon that is supposedly central to the process that transforms bisexual creatures into women.  Kofman notes, however, that this process amounts to transforming into a woman “a little girl who has first been a little boy” because within psychoanalysis pre-Oedipal bisexuality affirms the “original predominance of masculinity (in both sexes)” (EW 111-122).  She draws extensively on Freud’s biography, as well as his texts, to make clear how he characterizes women as defined both by lack (their penis envy) and their excess (“her narcissistic self-sufficiency and her indifference” which leaves the male “emptied of this original narcissism in favor of the love object” [EW 52]), another classic deconstructive self-contradiction.  Ultimately, she argues that penis envy, Freud’s “idée fixe”, and indeed his whole account of femininity and female sexuality, “allows him to blame nature for the cultural injustice by which man subordinates woman’s sexual desires to his”.  She also notes Freud’s surprise that, given all this, women might be hostile to men or frigid (EW 208-209).

In The Man of Reason (1984) Genevieve Lloyd undertakes a feminist reading on a larger historical scale, deconstructing (although she does not use that term) major philosophical texts from Plato to Simone de Beauvoir along a fault line that would equate reason with the masculine.  The hierarchical dualism found in deconstruction (speech/writing, male/female, and so forth.)  in epistemologically-oriented English language philosophy take the form rational/irrational, knowledge/ignorance, and so forth.  Lloyd traces the ways in which these last two pairs maintained a powerfully gendered meaning as the concept of Reason itself evolved through the history of European philosophy.  After 1600, public/private and universal/particular became politically important additions to the list; in the twentieth century existentialism adds transcendence/embodiment.  Most important, Lloyd says, has been the underlying pair superior/inferior.  As we have already seen, whatever is on the masculine side of the dichotomy is assumed, simply from that fact, to have value; whatever is the feminine side, to have none.  Again, like Derrida, Cixous and Clément, Lloyd rejects a move to reverse this polarity because “ironically, it [would] occur in a space already prepared for it by the intellectual tradition it seeks to reject” (MR 105).  Perhaps more optimistic than her French counterparts, Lloyd ends with her own version of the deconstructive double gesture:  “Philosophy has defined ideals of Reason through exclusions of the feminine.  But it also contains within it the resources for critical reflection on those ideals and on its own aspirations” (MR 109).

4. References and Further Readings

a. References

  • Benhabib, Seyla, Judith Butler, Drucilla Cornell, and Nancy Fraser. Feminist Contentions: A Philosophical Exchange. New York: Routledge, 1995. (FC)
  • Bloom, Harold, Paul de Man, Jacques Derrida, Geoffrey Hartman, and J. Hillis Miller. Deconstruction and Criticism. New York: The Seabury Press,1979. (DC)
  • Borradori, Giovanna. Philosophy in a Time of Terror: Dialogues with Jürgen Harbermas and Jacques Derrida. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2003. (PT)
  • Cixous, Hélène, and Catherine Clément. The Newly Born Woman, Betsy Wing, trans. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1986. (NBW)
  • Critchley, Simon, Jacques Derrida, Ernesto Laclau, and Richard Rorty. Deconstruction and Pragmatism, Chantal Mouffe, ed. New York: Routledge, 1996. (DP)
  • Derrida, Jacques. Positions, Alan Bass, trans. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1981. (P)
  • Derrida, Jacques. Dissemination, Barbara Johnson, trans. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1981. (D)
  • Derrida, Jacques. The Ear of the Other: Otobiography, Transference, Translation, Christie V. McDonald, ed., Peggy Kamuf, trans. NewYork: Schocken, 1985. (EO)
  • Derrida, Jacques. The Truth in Painting, Geoff Bennington and Ian McLeod, trans. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1987. (TP)
  • Derrida, Jacques, and Christie V. McDonald. “Choreographies”, in Feminist Interpretations of Jacques Derrida, Nancy J. Holland, ed. University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1997.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Paper Machine, Rachel Bowlby, trans. Palo Alto, CA: Stanford University Press, 2005. (PM)
  • Descartes, René. The Philosophical Words of Descartes, Volume I, Elizabeth S. Haldane and G. R. T. Ross, trans. (Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1911).
  • Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time, John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson, trans. New York: Harper, 1962. (BT)
  • Heidegger, Martin. “The Origin of the Work of Art” in Poetry, Language, Thought, Albert Hofstadter, trans. New York: Harper, 1971.
  • Jones, Ernest. Hamlet and Oedipus. New York: Doubleday, 1954.
  • Kofman, Sarah. The Enigma of Woman: Woman in Freud’s Writings, Catherine Porter, trans. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1985. (EW)
  • Lloyd, Genevieve. The Man of Reason: “Male” and “Female” in Western Philosophy. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984. (MR)
  • Michelfelder, Diane P., and Richard E. Palmer, eds. Dialogue and Deconstruction: The Gadamer-Derrida Encounter. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1989. (DD)

b. Additional Readings

  • Armour, Ellen T.  Deconstruction, Feminist Theology, and the Problem of Difference. Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1999.
    • Excellent, but dense, example of the political use of deconstruction.
  • Bordo, Susan R.  The Flight to Objectivity:  Essays on Cartesianism & Culture.  Albany, NY:  State University of New York Press, 1987.
    • Excellent, accessible feminist deconstruction of Descartes.
  • Cornell, Drucilla.  Beyond Accommodation:  Ethical Feminism, Deconstruction, and the Law. Lanham, MD:  Rowman & Littlefield, 1999.
    • Excellent, but dense, example of the use of deconstruction in legal theory.
  • Derrida, Jacques.  Writing and Difference, Alan Bass, trans.  Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1978.
    • Early deconstructions of Foucault, Hegel, Husserl, and others.
  • Derrida, Jacques.  Margins – Of Philosophy, Alan Bass, trans.  Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1982.
    • Early deconstructions of Heidegger, Hegel, and J. L. Austin.
  • Derrida, Jacques, and Anne Dufourmantelle.  Of Hospitality, Rachel Bowlby, trans. Palo Alto, CA:  Stanford University Press, 2000.
    • Addresses issues of gender, immigration, and the political state.
  • Derrida, Jacques.  Rogues:  Two Essays on Reason, Pascale-Anne Brault and Michael Naas.  Palo Alto, CA:  Stanford University Press, 2005.
    • Excellent political and feminist late deconstruction.
  • Derrida, Jacques.  Psyche:  Inventions of the Other, Volume II, Peggy Kamuf and Elizabeth Rottenber, eds.  Stanford, CA:  Stanford University Press, 2008.
    • Includes both “Geschlecht” articles on Heidegger and gender, plus other important papers from 1998-2003.
  • Fraser, Nancy.  Unruly Practices:  Power, Discourse and Gender in Contemporary Social Theory.  Minneapolis:  University of Minnesota Press, 1989.
    • A major feminist theorist who is critical of deconstruction.
  • Kofman, Sarah.  Selected Writings, Thomas Albrecht, ed., with Georgia Albert and Elizabeth Rotten berg.   Stanford, CA:  Stanford University Press, 2007.
  • Moi, Toril, ed.  The Kristeva Reader.  New York:  Columbia University Press, 1986.
  • Sellers, Susan, ed.  The Hélène Cixous Reader.  New York:  Routledge, 1994. (CR)
  • Silverman, Hugh J., and Gary Aylesworth, eds.   The Textual Sublime:  Deconstruction and its Differences.   Albany, NY:  State University of New York Press, 1990.
    • Several interesting articles on deconstruction, including one by Paul DeMan.
  • Taylor, Mark C., ed.  Deconstruction in Context:  Literature and Philosophy.  Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1986.
    • Collection of philosophical writings from Kant onward that provides some of the historical context for deconstruction.
  • Whitford, Margaret, ed.  The Irigaray Reader.  Malden, MA:  Blackwell, 1991.

Author Information

Nancy J. Holland
Email: nholland@gw.hamline.edu
Hamline University
U. S. A.

Roger Bacon (1214–1292)

Roger BaconRoger Bacon's most noteworthy philosophical accomplishments were in the fields of mathematics, natural sciences, and language studies. A conspicuous feature of his philosophical outlook was his emphasis on the utility and practicality of all scientific efforts. Bacon was convinced that mathematics and astronomy are not morally neutral activities, pursued for their own sake, but have a deep connection to the practical business of everyday life. Bacon was committed to the view that wisdom should contribute to the improvement of life. For example, his extensive works on the reform and reorganization of the university curriculum were, on the surface, aimed at reforming the study of theology; yet, ultimately, they contained a political program whose goal was to civilize humankind as well as to secure peace and prosperity for the whole of the Christian world, both in the hereafter and in this world.

During his long and productive life, he was a Master of Arts and Franciscan friar who was committed to a philosophical outlook that was deeply imbued with Christian principles as well as scientific curiosity and ambition. In many cases, his ideas betray him as a child of his time, and yet his thinking was well in advance of his contemporaries.

Bacon is noteworthy for being one of the West's first commentators and lecturers on Aristotle's philosophy and science. He has been called Doctor Mirabilis (wonderful teacher) and described variously as a rebel, traditionalist, reactionary, martyr to scientific progress, and the first modern scientist. Unfortunately, these romantic epithets tend to blur the actual nature of his philosophical achievements.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
    1. Life
    2. Works
      1. Early Works: 1240s–1250s
      2. Works for Pope Clement IV: 1266–1268
      3. Later Works: Late 1260s–1292
  2. The General Trajectory of Roger Bacon’s Philosophy
    1. Utility and Wisdom
    2. The Critique of University Learning
    3. Reform of Education
    4. Human Happiness and the Sciences
  3. Bacon on Language
  4. Mathematics and Natural Sciences
    1. General Remarks
      1. Bacon’s Modification of the Quadrivium
      2. Bacon’s Scientific Views and the Condemnation of 1277
    2. The Nature and Value of Mathematics
      1. The Object and Division of Mathematics
      2. The Methodological Relevance of Mathematics
      3. The Physical Relevance of Mathematics
    3. Bacon’s Theory of Physical Causation and Perspective
    4. Experimental Science
      1. Experience and Experiment
      2. The Three Prerogatives of Experimental Science
      3. Bacon as Experimenter
    5. Alchemy and Medicine
  5. Moral Philosophy
    1. General Scope and Nature of Bacon’s Moral Philosophy
      1. Morality and Happiness
      2. The Place of Moral Philosophy within the Hierarchy of Sciences
      3. Practical Sciences and Human Practice
      4. The Functional Division of Moral Philosophy
    2. Moral Philosophy in the Service of Human Moral Agency
      1. The Conversion of Non-Christians
      2. Moral Works and Eloquence
      3. Rhetoric and Poetics as Branches of Moral Philosophy
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Bibliographies
    2. Primary Sources
      1. 1240s–1250s
      2. 1250s–1268
      3. 1268–1292
    3. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Works

a. Life

Any attempt to reconstruct Bacon’s life must rely on very few sources, among which the most important is one of Bacon’s own works, Opus Tertium (c. 1267). Since Bacon’s personal report is ambiguous, his biographical data as well as the chronology of his education and career are still a matter of dispute among scholars. Scholars argue as to whether he was born in 1210, 1214, 1215, or even as late as 1220. Despite these disagreements, it is at least agreed that, in view of the funds available to him to pursue his private research, he was likely born into a well-to-do family.

Bacon described his intellectual biography as being divided into two distinct periods: a first “secular” period lasting until around 1257, during which he worked as an academic, and a second period, which he spent as a Franciscan friar “in the pursuit of wisdom.” As a secular scholar, Bacon pursued his academic career at two of the earliest European universities. First he attended the University of Oxford and then the University of Paris. He probably earned his Master of Arts around 1240 and continued his career as a lecturer in the Faculty of Arts at the University of Paris throughout the 1240s. He probably resigned from his post as Regent Master of Arts in Paris in 1247 and returned to Oxford. After this time, Bacon does not seem to have ever held academic office again. The next ten years of Bacon’s life have proven difficult for scholars to reconstruct. It is known that during this time Bacon continued to pursue his scientific and linguistic studies. During this time he probably also received some training in theology by Adam Marsh (d. 1258), the first Regent Master of the Franciscans in Oxford. This training, however, never culminated in a degree in theology. In or around 1257, he joined the Franciscan Order, probably in Oxford. The exact reasons for why he chose this order are unknown, but there are reasons to think that he hoped the Franciscans would support his scholarly interests. After all, the Oxford Franciscans had attracted prominent scholars such as Robert Grosseteste (d. 1253) and Adam Marsh.

The beginning of the 1260s found Bacon again in Paris. It has been speculated that he was transferred there by the superiors of his order because of growing suspicion about his scientific studies. While in Paris, he finished several of his major works, including Opus Maius (OM), Opus Minus (OMi), and Opus Tertium (OT). The exact details of Bacon’s whereabouts and doings in the decades before his death remain uncertain. It seems clear, however, that he returned to Oxford sometime after 1278. Between 1277 and 1279, he was supposedly condemned to house arrest by the Franciscans’ Master General Jerome of Ascoli. The charge against him was that some of his doctrines contained “certain suspected novelties.” What these novelties were—whether relating to his teachings on alchemy, astronomy, experimental science, or his radical spiritual leanings—cannot be determined with precision (Easton, 1952, 192-202). Bacon’s punishment  can likely be explained in the context of the Parisian Condemnations of 1270 and 1277. In the last years of his life, Bacon continued to work on what was, in all likelihood, his last treatise, Compendium Studii Theologie. He died in 1292, or soon thereafter, in Oxford.

b. Works

i. Early Works: 1240s–1250s

During his time at the Faculty of Arts at the University of Paris, Bacon lectured on many Aristotelian texts, the so-called libri naturales, including On the Soul, On Sense and the Sensible, Physics, Metaphysics, and probably On Generation and Corruption. Not all of these lectures have survived. We possess copies of two lectures on Physics, three lectures on different books of Metaphysics as well as lectures on the pseudo-Aristotelian works, Book of Causes and On Plants. The form of these lectures is that of quaestiones, or ‘questions’, which involve the presentation of expository and critical questions combined with explanatory comments. These lectures represent Bacon’s earliest teachings on topics such as causality, motion, being, soul, substance, and truth. Bacon’s quaestiones were not written by Bacon himself, but consist in notes that his students took during his lectures. These notes might have been checked later by Bacon for accuracy. With the exception of a set of quaestiones on Physics II–IV, these writings survive in one single manuscript. These lectures—together with the lectures of Richard Rufus of Cornwall (d. 1260) —mark some of the earliest known examinations of Aristotle’s Metaphysics and the libri naturales from the Faculty of Arts at Paris.

During the 1240s and 1250s, Bacon composed a series of works on logical and grammatical matters dealing with syntactic as well as semantic issues. These include the Summa Grammatica (‘Summary of Grammar’; c. 1245), Summa de Sophismatibus et Distinctionibus (‘Summary of Sophisms and Distinctions’; c. 1240–1245) and Summulae Dialectices (‘Summary of Dialectics’; probably completed after Bacon’s return to Oxford in the 1250s). These works show that Bacon was one of the earliest proponents of the so-called terminist logic. Terminist logic was referred to by medieval scholars as Logica Modernorum or Moderna (‘contemporary logic’), and was originated by scholars such as William of Sherwood (d. 1266/72) and Petrus Hispanus (d. 1277). Contemporary logic was so-called by the medieval masters themselves in order to describe and distinguish their new, contextual approach toward logic, which consisted in an emphasis on the analysis of the signifying properties of terms in a propositional as well as a pragmatic context.

Sometime in the late 1250s or early 1260s Bacon composed another treatise entitled De Multiplicatione Specierum (‘On the Multiplication of Species’). In this work Bacon developed a doctrine that he considered to be central to his natural philosophy. Specifically, he aimed in this work to explain natural causation through the concept of species; more will be said about this matter this below.

ii. Works for Pope Clement IV: 1266–1268

The works for which Bacon is most widely known are a group of writings commissioned by Pope Clement IV, comprising the Opus Maius, Opus Minus, and Opus Tertium. All of these works are rhetorical in the sense that Bacon attempted to persuade the Pope to support his research and to help him to implement his projected reform of studies. The reform program suggested by Bacon was very extensive and encompassed the study of languages, mathematics, the natural sciences, moral philosophy, and theology.

The circumstances under which Bacon composed these works are well documented in his own statements. Sometime in the early 1260s, Bacon sought the patronage of Cardinal Guy de Foulques, papal legate to England during the Civil War. From the ensuing correspondence it became clear that the cardinal would not provide the funds Bacon needed to complete his writings but that he was nevertheless interested in Bacon’s reform ideas. He asked Bacon to send him his writings. Bacon had nothing to send to the cardinal, however, because completing his works required money for books, scientific equipment, and copyists—money Bacon did not have. In 1265, however, the situation changed dramatically when Cardinal Guy de Foulques was elected Pope Clement IV. Bacon soon sent the new Pope a letter asking for aid, to which the Pope replied in June 1266, asking Bacon to send the writings containing “the remedies for the critical problems” Bacon had mentioned to him a few years before and to do so “as quickly and secretly as possible.” Yet, in 1266 Bacon’s financial needs were no different from a few years before. In addition to Bacon’s financial predicament, there was another complicating factor at work: the Franciscan Order was in a time of crisis over dogmatic issues, and in response to these issues, the General chapter at Narbonne (1260) imposed strict censorship on the Order and forbade direct communication with the papal curia. Under these conditions—insufficient funds, time pressure, forbidden communication with the Pope, and growing suspicion within the order against Bacon’s own scientific and spiritual leanings—Bacon was forced to compose a much shorter, more rhetorical work (or persuasio), rather than the longer work (scriptum principale) he originally envisioned. In a short period of time, Bacon completed several writings, rhetorically structured in a way so as to best persuade the Pope of his ideas. Late in 1267 or early in 1268 he sent out the Opus Maius, partly patched together from previous writings, and the Opus Minus. It was common practice for Bacon to borrow from his other works; the fourth part of the Opus Maius contained an abbreviation of the earlier De Multiplicatione Specierum. The Opus Tertium was probably never sent. The works arrived safely. However, since the Pope died in 1268, it remains unknown whether he had a chance to study Bacon’s works, and, if he did, how he received them.

iii. Later Works: Late 1260s–1292

Although historical evidence for Bacon’s whereabouts during the final stage of his career is scarce, it is certain that he remained active. In the late 1260s and early 1270s, while still in Paris, he may have worked on the Communia Mathematica and Communia Naturalium; the polemic Compendium Studii Philosophiae (CSP) was probably written around 1272. He put together basic grammars for both Greek and Hebrew, and he also wrote two medical treatises, De Erroribus Medicorum and Antidotarius. Sometime in the two decades before his death, he completed his elaborate edition of the pseudo-Aristotelian Secretum Secretorum for which he prepared a redaction of the text, annotated it, and wrote an accompanying introductory treatise (Williams, 1994). His last work, written when he was around seventy years old, was a treatise on semiotics, the Compendium Studii Theologie, which is incomplete.

2. The General Trajectory of Roger Bacon’s Philosophy

a. Utility and Wisdom

The length of Bacon’s career and the diversity of his philosophical interests and accomplishments make it impossible to capture his philosophy in a simple summary. In regard to Bacon’s work on Aristotle and the Arab commentators during his first stay in Paris, one could speak of Bacon as a pioneer in Aristotelian studies.  Yet these early works give little hint of his later and much more specialized interests in science, semantics, moral philosophy, and Christian theology. Bacon’s later work as a Franciscan scholar differed significantly from his earlier work in both content and purpose.

A possible reason for the change in Bacon’s scholarly interests may have been his encounter with the pseudo-Aristotelian work Secretum Secretorum while at Paris during the 1240s. The Secretum Secretorum was composed in the form of a pseudo-epigraphical letter from Aristotle to Alexander the Great, belonging to the literary genre mirrors for princes. With the purpose of providing insight into the art of government, the anonymous author treats of secret doctrines useful to a political ruler, among which are ethics, alchemy, and medicine. It might be the case that Bacon, after reading the Secretum, was inspired to develop the vision that henceforth guided his philosophical efforts and consisted of a conception of Christian learning applicable to the needs of humankind, both worldly and otherworldly. For a critical evaluation of the supposed influence of the Secretum Secretorum on Bacon’s views see Williams, 1997, 368-372. The principles around which his thoughts subsequently developed had a strong connection to concrete socio-political affairs, and his outlook on the sciences became focused on applicability, practicality, and usefulness. This practical outlook on the sciences, as being in the service of humankind, manifested itself in positive and negative remarks made in writings like the Opus Maius or Compendium Studii Philosophiae. His negative remarks consisted of incessant critiques of what he perceived to be the desolate, that is, practically useless, state of learning during his time. His positive remarks focused on proposals about the benefits and possibilities of the practical application of the different branches of knowledge.

The medieval use of the term science should not be confused with the modern use, which is distinct from philosophical and  theological inquiry. Rather, 13th century thinkers understood the term science in accordance with the Aristotelian framework of epistemic or apodeictic knowledge. According to Aristotle in Posterior Analytics, science denotes intellectual comprehension of a true, necessary, and universal proposition, known or presented in the form of a demonstrative proof and providing an understanding of why the proposition is true. In other words, Aristotelian science involves knowledge of a reasoned fact—an understanding of science that is far broader than the modern understanding of empirical science. Despite the fact that almost all scholastics endorsed the Aristotelian paradigm of science, there was wide variation in the medieval scholars’ accounts of the foundation and scope of Aristotelian science, depending on their ontological, epistemological, and logical commitments.  Bacon, like other thinkers, oftentimes used the terms science and philosophy interchangeably, thereby referring to a group of disciplines that conform to the aforementioned Aristotelian paradigm. According to Bacon, the sciences or philosophy comprise disparate disciplines such as moral philosophy and metaphysics.

The pivotal concepts around which all of Bacon’s philosophical efforts revolved were utilitas (‘utility’) and sapientia (‘wisdom’). Bacon used the concept of utility in the context of his reflections on the relation, scope, and goal of the sciences. More specifically, he used the term in two senses: (1) to describe the hierarchy between the sciences and (2) to refer to the function of the sciences, namely, the improvement of the physical and spiritual well-being of humankind in this world and the next. With respect to the hierarchy of the sciences, he regarded the theoretical sciences to be subordinate to the practical sciences. For him, the former is instrumental in achieving the goals of the latter. Here it is important to keep in mind that Bacon’s conception of philosophy did not entail the patristic idea that philosophy is merely a handmaiden of theology (philosophia ancilla theologiae). Philosophy, although useful for theology, is not reduced to theology. On the contrary, Bacon believed that theology, in order to fulfill its purpose, was heavily reliant on philosophy (OM II, vol. 3, 36). And yet, the utility of both philosophy and theology ultimately refer to the God-ordained purpose of the created world, which Bacon recognized in the return of all creatures to their divine origin.

Concerning wisdom, Bacon uses the term to refer to the complete body of knowledge given by God to humankind for the purpose of humankind’s happiness and salvation. In a sense, all knowledge for Bacon was contained in the Scriptures and should be unfolded by philosophy and canon law.  The manner, however, in which philosophy unfolds the basic truths in the Scriptures is different from the manner of theology. According to Bacon, these “exegetic” disciplines, philosophy and canon law, were first revealed to the early prophets and patriarchs and then handed down through generations of true “lovers of wisdom, ” like prophets, patriarchs, and pagan philosophers, in the form of divine and secular texts. Bacon presented the process of the transmission of knowledge by way of an elaborate genealogy (OM I, vol. 3, 53f). He deemed it necessary to provide a comprehensive defense of wisdom together with the means by which it could be restored because he perceived his contemporaries to be limiting wisdom in scope and content, in fact to be corrupting it.  The transmission of knowledge  was unfolded imperfectly due to the sins of some philosophers.. The targets of Bacon’s critique very well may have been the Parisian “Artists,” some of whom understood the search for wisdom to be a purely theoretical and specialized endeavor, or Bacon’s own Minister General Bonaventure who condemned suspicious disciplines like experimental science and alchemy. Thus the scientific vision Bacon began to promote in the 1260s consisted of very detailed and specific normative reflections on the status of learning, for which he sought the support of Pope Clement IV.

b. The Critique of University Learning

The critique of university learning that Bacon developed in several of his writings encompassed philosophy as well as theology. According to Bacon, neither the philosophy nor theology of his time adequately embody the wisdom God revealed to humankind. On the contrary, in both philosophy and theology Bacon perceived numerous errors, lacunae, and forms of corruption.  Thus he neither held back from denouncing them nor balked at accusing individual scholars of contributing to the demise of learning. In regard to the content of the curricula, for example, Bacon criticized the erroneous emphasis on logic and a particular kind of grammar and instead called for emphasis on rhetoric and the study of foreign languages. In several of his writings, most prominently in Opus Maius, Compendium Studii Philosophiae, and Compendium Studii Theologiae, he presented examples of ignorance, corruption, and error.

The scope of his critique of learning extended beyond the academy as well. Bacon drew connections between the state of affairs in the academy and the state of affairs in society because he did not regard these two spheres as separate but rather intimately connected. Bacon often stated that “by the light of wisdom the Church of God is governed, the republic of the faithful regulated, the conversion of infidels accomplished, and those who are obstinate in their malice, are more efficiently swayed toward the goals of the Church by the power of wisdom than by the shedding of Christian blood” (OM I, vol. 3, 1). Following from this, Bacon believed that the ultimate purpose of eradicating academic errors extended to the improvement of society. Bacon held that vain and useless academic practice was the cause of the ecclesiastic corruptions of pride, greed, and lust. In addition, Bacon did not spare worldly rulers from criticism (CSP, ch. 1, 398-400).

In his Opus Maius, Bacon pointed out four causes of error: (1) the example of unreliable and unsuited authorities, (2) the long duration of habit, (3) the opinion of the ignorant masses, and (4) the propensity of humans for disguising ignorance by the display of pseudo-wisdom. Bacon judged that all human evil is a result of these errors, and thus the reform that Bacon intended had to begin with reform in the educational institutions and the sciences. For example, Bacon identified one group of obstacles to wisdom in the practices of university teachers.  The teachers wasted time and money on useless things and subjects because, instead of intellectual humility, they indulged in conformity and vanity (OM I, vol. 3, 2f). Thus scientific errors cast a long shadow, and the reform of learning was the only way  by which to remedy society’s academic, social, and political troubles as they existed within the Christian community or even beyond it, in regard to the interactions with non-Christians such as Saracens or Jews.

c. Reform of Education

The reform program that Bacon proposed to Pope Clement IV was comprehensive in that it involved theology as well as most philosophical disciplines. Bacon revealed his depreciatory judgment of certain theological practices when in his Opus Minus he listed “the seven sins of the principal study which is theology”  (OMi, 322). He included the “modern” practice of theologians introducing questions into theology that properly belong to the province of philosophy, such as questions about celestial bodies, matter and being, how the soul perceived through images or similitudes, and how souls and angels moved locally. In addition to questions of content, Bacon also found fault with the methods employed by modern theologians. For example, Bacon complained that questions about the sacraments or the Trinity were addressed using philosophical methods involving philosophical terminology, arguments and conceptual distinctions rather than using proper traditional Scriptural exegesis. Exegesis, on the other hand, suffered because of (1) the overemphasis placed on Peter Lombard’s (d. c.1160) Four Books of Sentences, (2) the deficient state of the Paris Vulgate, and (3) the neglect and ignorance of those sciences most useful for an accurate literal understanding of the text, which would advance exegesis according to the spiritual senses (OMi, 322-359).

Bacon proposed extensive reform measures to remedy these problems. He advised providing new translations of philosophical works and the Scriptures prepared by translators who were experts not only with regard to mastery of the respective languages but also the philosophical and theological material. Bacon called for an extensive modification of the curricula. He wanted to  implement disciplines that were of real value to the progress of learning and that were not being studied properly at the time, like perspective (optics), experimental science, and alchemy. He also wanted to reform disciplines that, although being taught and studied, were studied with a wrong focus; here Bacon pointed to logic. For the use of the term progress in relation to Bacon see Molland, 1978, 567-571. For Bacon, studying logic was neither an end in itself nor the basis for the other sciences. On the contrary, Bacon held that logic is instrumentally valuable to theology and philosophy only insofar as it promotes understanding through semiotic and semantic analyses. It becomes superfluous when practiced as an inquiry into rules of argumentation. This was judged to be so because, according to Bacon, the knowledge of such rules is innate, which explains why logic does not provide scientists with special methodological principles or rules (OT, ch. xxviii, 102f). To counteract his contemporaries’ emphasis on logic, Bacon proposed to focus instead on mathematics.  He believed neither philosophical nor theological matters could be properly understood without employing mathematics (OM IV, vol. 3, 175). Bacon’s reform program included the introduction of five main sciences that he thought were neglected or misunderstood by his contemporaries. Apart from mathematics, these were the science of languages, perspective, moral philosophy, experimental science, and alchemy. According to Bacon, these sciences were more conducive to the advancement of the mind, the body, and society than some of the sciences preferred by his contemporaries, such as logic, the less significant parts of natural philosophy, and a part of metaphysics. (OMi, 323f).

d. Human Happiness and the Sciences

Bacon’s later research in logic and languages, moral philosophy, and the natural sciences were fueled by his conviction that the spheres of scientific work and of everyday life were intimately connected. Bacon believed that the status of learning affects the quality of individuals’ lives in a variety of ways. After all, erroneous ideas or theories can yield harmful social consequences.  Knowledge and learning are not private affairs but have a socio-political dimension. Thus he was persuaded that the sciences, both secular and divine, should serve human society as a whole in reaching happiness and salvation. He subsequently determined the respective rank of each science by the degree of its usefulness, that is, how much each of them contributed to human happiness. The theoretical sciences were thus subordinated to the practical goal of human happiness, as mentioned above. Since, according to Bacon, human happiness consists in salvation as understood by Christians, the highest science is Sacred doctrine or theology. Yet despite its formal supremacy, theology is still dependent on philosophy in that theology is incapable of accomplishing its goal without philosophy, that is, grammar, mathematics, experimental science, and moral philosophy (OM II, vol. 3, 36). In relation to theology, Bacon held moral philosophy to be the second highest discipline because it aims at salvation within the secular context of natural reason rather than revelation (MP I, §4, 4). In turn, Bacon held that the theoretical sciences, such as mathematics, are subordinate to moral philosophy. The goal of mathematics consists of explaining and describing the structure of the natural world, providing a kind of knowledge that contributes to practical ends only indirectly. Whereas, by contrast, the knowledge provided by moral philosophy is of immediate practical value.

According to Bacon, then, scientific research has an overall moral orientation, with both an emphasis on the afterlife and also an eye on practical worldly affairs. (CSP, ch. i, 395). The unifying purpose of all scientific study for Bacon is practical, which is why the practical sciences have priority over the theoretical. The practical value of a science is determined by the degree to which each science contributes to the improvement of human life. Improvements can be secondary, by technical innovation, or primary, by guiding the moral and spiritual life of humans, exhorting people to a virtuous and law-abiding practice that will ultimately be rewarded with eternal happiness: salvation in union with God.

3. Bacon on Language

Like many of his contemporaries, Roger Bacon attached great value to issues pertaining to the so-called Trivium. The Trivium, or the ‘three ways’ or ‘three roads’ of learning, was comprised of grammar, logic, and rhetoric.  The Trivium constituted the trivial, that is, fundamental, part of the learning system, which consisted of the seven liberal arts, that was in place during late antiquity and much of medieval times. The remaining four arts, called the Quadrivium, were the mathematical disciplines: arithmetic, geometry, astronomy, and music.

Bacon’s study of language was broad, extending from semantics and semiotics to philology as well as to the socio-cultural question of the place of language studies within institutions of higher learning and society as a whole. Bacon's study of speech and languages was not merely theoretical. His interest in understanding language, and his personal study of foreign languages like Hebrew and Greek,was motivated by his belief in the eminent practical importance of the study of speech and language. Bacon considered language mastery necessary for four purposes: (1) ecclesiastical functions, (2) the reform of knowledge, (3) the conversion of infidels, and (4) the battle against the Antichrist. Generally speaking, the goal of Bacon’s concern for languages was, in both his linguistic as well as his philological efforts, situated within the wider context of his intended reform of learning, aimed at the “Church and the Republic of the Faithful.”  In addition, Bacon considered the knowledge of language, including an understanding of how words signify, an important prerequisite for any kind of philosophical or theological pursuit.

In Bacon’s work on linguistic and philological matters one can distinguish between two different stages. In the first stage, represented by the Summa grammatica, Summa de Sophismatibus et Distinctionibus, and Summulae Dialectices, we find Bacon’s contributions to the problem of universal quantification and to semantic problems revolving around the properties of terms. In particular, Bacon worked here on the problem of univocal appellation and predication in regards to what are called empty classes.  Bacon’s solutions, especially to the semantic problems, provide the theoretical background against which he continued to develop his doctrines during the second stage of his work on logic and linguistic matters. In the second stage, represented by the De Signis and Compendium Studii Theologiae, Bacon worked on a theory of analogy, developed a theory of the imposition of signs, and, related to this, developed a view of the definition and classification of signs. The Compendium Studii Theologiae represents a later adjustment of the material brought forth in the De Signis.  His work on philology stems largely from this later phase and is contained mainly in the Opus Tertium and Compendium Studii Philosophiae. He also wrote a Greek grammar, Oxford Greek Grammar, the first of its kind in the west and a work which he considered to be no more than an “introduction to the Greek language.” In these writings Bacon studied grammar insofar as it (1) pertained and contributed to the reading and speaking of languages and (2) contributed to an improvement of the methods and instruments of textual criticism.

Bacon’s views on logic and language included some unique claims and arguments. Bacon’s work on semantic problems—such as connotation and equivocation—was especially noteworthy. In his early work Summa de sophismatibus et distinctionibus, written in Paris, Bacon contributed to the debate on semantic information contained in ambiguous sentences.  The theory of so-called natural sense, popular among some 13th century logicians, proposed that semantic information is grounded in the order in which terms are organized in a sentence. Bacon believed, however, that other aspects of communication must be considered. Sentence structure alone is not sufficient to decode the semantic information contained in a sentence. He challenged the theory of natural sense in his doctrine of the “generation of speech” by emphasizing the relation between the intention of the speaker, linguistic form, and interpretation of the hearer in the context of understanding meaning. In short, understanding semantic information is, for him, a matter of interpretation. Another important claim of Bacon’s, which connects the early Summulae dialectices with the later De signis, relates to the question of whether terms can univocally signify existent and nonexistent, or universal and particular entities. For Bacon, terms like Caesar or Christ signify presently existing entities only and signify equivocally when predicated of a dead person. This semantic position, which would classify Bacon today as a semantic externalist, put Bacon in opposition to a number of his contemporaries, most famously Richard of Cornwall.

In addition to semantics, Bacon also did important work in semiotics and signification and developed views which in some cases were radically different from 13th century mainstream opinion. He challenged a number of common tenets on the nature of signs. Bacon worked within the Augustinian framework, according to which signs are in the category of relation,  and emphasized that signification is a three-term relation. A sign, take a word for example, is a sign of something to some interpreter.  More specifically, Bacon’s theory of signs stressed the “pragmatic” relation of the sign to the interpreter and thus underscored the context in which a sign is situated instead of the sign’s relation to the significate, as was the commonly held opinion. Another important element in his work in semantics is his analysis of imposition, that is, the act of name-giving. He distinguishes between two modes of imposition: (1) the very first imposition by the first name-giver and (2) subsequently applying a name to something different than what the name signifies according to its first imposition. Bacon thought of the very first imposition as an act similar to baptism. He understood it in terms of a situation in which a word is chosen as a label for a present thing. After which, the thing is called by that name.  In other words, the first imposition is the act by which a human name-giver decides to use a sound to refer to a thing and thereby endows that sound with meaning, and a word is created. However, according to Bacon, speakers have the power to change the meaning of words in situations in which they need to express something they currently lack a word for or in which the particular thing which the word originally named ceases to exist. Bacon argued that the use of a word is not restricted to the meaning endowed to it during the first act of imposition. On the contrary, a speaker may apply a word to any other object, thereby imposing a new meaning and making the term equivocal. The term’s interpretation then depends on the speaker’s intention. Bacon believed that these kinds of modifications of meanings of words occur tacitly and constantly and sometimes even without people being conscious of it. Bacon considers metaphors as a prevalent example of second imposition. In addition, Bacon also developed a comprehensive classification of signs or modes of signification, into which he integrated substantial semantic analyses. According to Bacon’s notion of signification, as part of his theory of imposition, signs immediately signify the things themselves rather than mental concepts or representations of things in the mind of the speaker.

4. Mathematics and Natural Sciences

a. General Remarks

Among Roger Bacon’s most widely known contributions to philosophy are his reflections and arguments pertaining to the fields of mathematics and the natural sciences.  Within the latter, Bacon is especially known for his emphasis on experience and on experimental science (scientia experimentalis), including optics, also called perspective (perspectiva or scientia de aspectibus). Many of his reflections on the physical world were presented in the context of his extensive critique of university learning dating from the 1260s, which oftentimes lent a rhetorical and pedagogical tenor. However, Bacon’s contributions to this field were not restricted to polemics. Apart from the papal opera (Opus Maius, Opus Minus, and Opus Tertium), his most important works on mathematical and physical topics were the De Multiplicatione Specierum (‘On the Multiplication of Species’; dated prior to the papal opera), the Communia Naturalium, and the Communia Mathematica, both dated after 1267.

Bacon’s accomplishments in these fields do not consist of reports of concrete scientific practice or specific methodological guidance in experimentation. On the whole, his work in mathematics and the natural sciences was more theoretical. He defended noteworthy pedagogical and methodological insights pertaining to the mathematization of natural philosophy for example. He also made the somewhat successful effort to reconcile the disparate Platonic and Aristotelian scientific approaches and thereby present a practicable and convincing synthesis (Fisher and Unguru, 1971, 375; Lindberg, 1979, 268).

i. Bacon’s Modification of the Quadrivium

In the Latin medieval tradition, arithmetic, geometry, music, and astrology were subsumed into the Quadrivium. Together with the so-called Trivium (grammar, logic, rhetoric), they formed the two parts of the seven liberal arts (septem artes liberales). At the time the seven liberal arts were considered to be branches of philosophy. All of the quadrivial or mathematical arts dealt with quantity, the principle according to which things were said to be equal or unequal. Arithmetic and music dealt with discrete quantities, or numbers, whereas geometry and astronomy dealt with continuous quantities, such as lines. Traditionally, the mathematical or quadrivial disciplines constituted the medieval “scientific syllabus” in that they studied the natural world. Under the metaphysical assumption that every physical entity was formed through the essence of number and that physical phenomena could thus be “broken down” into arithmetical or geometrical terms, the natural world could be described using the quadrivial disciplines. Astronomy, for example, studied the motion of celestial bodies by employing numerical calculation and geometry.

Bacon’s concern for the quadrivial disciplines was ultimately ethical. By procuring the Pope’s support for a reform of liberal arts studies, he hoped to improve student learning and to boost scientific progress, which would ultimately serve the development of moral persons. (For the use of the term progress in regard to Bacon see Molland 1978.) For this purpose, Bacon modified the inherited division by adding new sciences to the traditional four. He identified a list of seven “special sciences,” among which he included perspective (optics), judicial astronomy (astrology), the science of weights, medicine, experimental science, alchemy, and agriculture. Bacon held that three of these sciences are especially important: judicial astronomy, alchemy, and experimental science (CN, I, 5). Yet, beyond just listing sciences worthy of study, Bacon made the case for new ways in which to approach some of the more established sciences, thereby introducing hitherto less known or neglected sources. In the case of perspective, for example, he advocated the use of Alhazen’s (al-Hasan ibn al-Haytham) De Aspectibus, or Perspectiva.

Bacon considered his contemporaries’ neglect of these “special sciences” to have detrimental consequences not only for the progress of learning but for the state of society as a whole. He reproached teachers and scholars of medicine for approaching their field in the wrong way because they neglected mathematics and experimentation. He scolded theologians for ignoring the “greater sciences” in their study of the Scriptures. Bacon thought a reform of liberal arts studies in general, and the Quadrivium in particular, was imperative because of the eminent utility of the mathematical and natural sciences. An improved understanding of the natural world would benefit Scriptural hermeneutics in that an understanding of the Scriptures' literal sense would lead to an improved understanding of their spiritual sense. Bacon believed his reforms would also foster a practical operative knowledge capable of alleviating all sorts of human ailments or of ensuring Christians’ supremacy in warfare. Although dissatisfaction with the status quo of teaching and research constituted much of Bacon's apology of the sciences, he also presented  original material on scientific method, in Scientia Experimentalis for example, as well as original scientific content,  like in his doctrine of physical causation.

ii. Bacon’s Scientific Views and the Condemnation of 1277

In advocating the “special sciences,” Bacon was concerned with the intellectual climate in which he found himself. The climate in Paris prior to Bishop Étienne Tempier’s issuance of a condemnation in 1277 was that of suspicion against Bacon’s most favored sciences: judicial astronomy, alchemy, and experimental science. With regard to the atmosphere in the Franciscan order, it is possible that Bonaventure, Bacon’s superior, partly had Bacon in mind when in his Collationes (1273) he accused “Aristotelian” philosophy of being at odds with Christian dogma. Thus much of Bacon’s presentation of, for example, judicial astrology and celestial influence was informed by wariness. He did not want to be charged with necessitarianism, the view that celestial events determine worldly events;among the doctrines impugned by Bishop Tempier was astrological determinism. In the context of alchemy and experimental science Bacon heeded the danger of being denounced for magic (OM IV, vol. 1, 137-139). However, Bacon was an outspoken supporter of natural magic, and he accused his opponents of “infinite stupidity” and deserving of being ridiculed as asses (asini) for ignoring the utility and benefits of judicial astronomy (OT, ch. lxv, 270). To forestall possible objections and charges, Bacon went to great lengths to distinguish magic proper, doctrines and practices accomplished with the help of demons, from “natural magic,” wondrous and awe-inspiring physical phenomena. He defended the respective sciences by naturalizing them. He provided arguments showing that seemingly magical effects imitate nature in their operations and do not use the aid of demons. One very important element in Bacon’s naturalistic explanation of supposedly magical phenomena, like astrological influence, was his theory of physical causation, best known as the multiplication of species (multiplicatio specierum, discussed further below). For Bacon’s view on magic see Molland 1974.

It is commonly agreed, however, that in certain respects Bacon’s views bordered on magical traditions. This is evident from his text De Secretis Operibus Artis et Naturae (‘On the Secret Works of Art and Nature,’ c. 1267) as well as from the third prerogative of experimental science in which Bacon’s imagination ran wild, projecting marvels like ever-burning lamps. These writings were kindled by the desire to benefit State and Church (OM VI, vol. 2, 217).

b. The Nature and Value of Mathematics

Secondary literature is not entirely favorable towards Bacon’s achievements in mathematics. It is commonly agreed that Bacon was not a creative mathematician. Yet it is also widely recognized that Bacon was well read and had a solid comprehension of the standard sources of 13th century mathematics. Bacon’s originality was more “in his thoughts about mathematics” rather than in his theoretical innovations (Fisher and Unguru, 1971, 355).

i. The Object and Division of Mathematics

Bacon adopted an Aristotelian abstractionist view of the objects of mathematical inquiry. Mathematics is the science dealing with objects whose principle was quantity. The form of quantity, though, had to be abstracted from motion and corporeal matter before it could be investigated by arithmetic or geometry. Although quantity exists in matter, in mathematics quantity is considered as abstracted from matter and motion. Bacon insisted, however, that in this abstracting procedure the imagination does not run the risk of positing quantity to exist by itself, in the manner of a Platonic form. That would defeat the purpose of mathematical inquiry, which is performed for utilitarian reasons, specifically for the sake of “corporeal quantity,” not for the sake of quantity itself (CM, 59).

One element that stands out in Bacon’s reflections about mathematics has to do with the division of the mathematical sciences, mainly presented in the third distinction of his Communia Mathematica. For pedagogical purposes, Bacon thought it important to distinguish between two principal branches of mathematical study. One branch deals with the universal themes of mathematics in terms of its “elements and roots;” this first branch can be termed common mathematics. The second branch deals with the specialized domains of geometry, arithmetic, music, and astronomy.

The second principal branch of mathematics is divided into two main parts: a speculative and a practical part. Following from this, each of the proper mathematical sciences can be seen, according to Bacon, to have a speculative as well as a practical side. For example, while the speculative part of geometry considers contiguous quantity removed from any practical concerns, the practical part of geometry applies geometrical insights to operational, concrete interests (CM, 38f) In either case, speculation must precede practice, which meant that Bacon considered mathematical theory to be subjugated to technological practice.

The postulation of “common mathematics” is considered to be the most original element of Bacon’s division of mathematics. In this context, Bacon leveled a critique of Euclid’s Elements, despite the fact that he believed Euclid was an important authority in the history of mathematics. Again, for Bacon, mathematics is the science dealing with quantity. The different specialized parts of mathematics deal with different kinds of quantity. Arithmetic and music deal with discrete quantities such as numbers. Geometry and astronomy deal with continuous quantities such as lines. The concept of quantity in general, however, could not be fully understood without a comprehension of the meaning of related concepts such as finite, infinite, position, and contiguous. Bacon criticized Euclid for being oblivious to a thorough treatment of these concepts. Such a treatment could be made by separating out a realm of common mathematics, which deals with quantity in general, and could be expressed by basic principles common to all mathematics (Molland, 1997, 165-168).

ii. The Methodological Relevance of Mathematics

Bacon’s favorite maxim in scientific matters consisted in emphasizing the utility of each science. As we have seen, this lead him to subjugate scientific research to the spiritual and concrete practical needs and interests of human beings. Since, for Bacon, the utility of a science is linked to its end, the end informs choices of content and form for each science. In other words, it did not only matter what was studied, but also how the results of those studies were presented to those needing instruction. In this respect, mathematics is no exception. A considerable part of Bacon’s reflections on mathematics were characterized by this “utilitarian” approach. It is not surprising, then, that Bacon considered mathematics to have no intrinsic value. According to Bacon, the mathematical disciplines (arithmetic, geometry, music, and astronomy) are of solely instrumental value. Doing mathematics should by no means be a purely theoretical inquiry. Yet, while emphasizing Bacon’s conviction that mathematics has no intrinsic value, it should not be overlooked that Bacon regarded mathematical study as instrumentally good for all the other sciences, including theology. Indeed, almost the whole of the fourth part of the Opus Maius is devoted to the presentation of the utility of mathematics in matters secular and divine.

According to Bacon, mathematics is “the gate and key” to the other sciences. Bacon regarded the comprehension of mathematical truth as being among the first steps in the order of cognition because “it is, so to speak, innate in us.” Mathematical objects by their very nature “are more knowable by us,” therefore, it is with these objects that our learning should commence (OM IV, vol. 1, 103-105). Indeed, Bacon went on to claim that a scientist who is ignorant of mathematics cannot have certain knowledge of either the other sciences or worldly matters. Mathematics, Bacon stressed, trained the mind for future study and raised the degree of knowledge acquired by the mind to the level of certainty (OM IV, vol. 1, 97). In other words, in order to practice the other sciences with a proper level of sophistication, or at all, mathematics is required. If the scientist’s goal is to truly understand the physical world, then she had to employ mathematics. This means that although mathematics is epistemologically vital to the progress of other sciences, it is not their queen in terms of dictating ends. In the order of learning, mathematics is ranked on the lower end (Molland, 1997, 164).

When Bacon stated that scientific study seeks to attain truths about the world, the term truth connotes a kind of knowledge in virtue. The human mind becomes peaceful in its scientific quest (ut quiescat animus in intuitu veritatis). To reach this state requires sense-based experience that brings the truth of scientific conclusions face-to-face with the scientist. In Bacon’s view, mathematics as well is subject to the general rule that the empirical dimension is essential to proper knowledge. For example, for a student to fully grasp the proof of the Euclidian equilateral triangle, she needs to see it actually being constructed (OM VI, vol. 2, 168). However, it is not simply the case that mathematics requires a verification of its conclusions through the aid of experiencing, as if this kind of experience were external to mathematical procedure. The reason why mathematical procedures are a guarantor for scientific certainty, according to Bacon, lies exactly in the fact that sense experience is an integral part of it. In mathematics there are necessary demonstrations that, because proceeding by way of necessary cause, achieve full and certain truth without error. In addition mathematics contains certifying experience as an intrinsic component of its basic operations, insofar as it has examples and tests that can be perceived by the senses, such as drawing figures or counting (OM IV, vol. 1, 105f). Thus, for Bacon, in order for the human mind tograsp the truth, it requires freedom from error and doubt, both of which mathematics is able to provide because of its connection to experience. The certifying potential of experience was further developed by Bacon in the sixth part of the Opus Maius, under the name of the first dignity of experimental science (prima prerogativa) (Fisher and Unguru, 1971).

iii. The Physical Relevance of Mathematics

Bacon can be regarded as having been among the first scholars to emphasize the physical relevance of mathematics. Bacon’s rationale for emphasizing the physical relevance of mathematics has epistemic elements, as discussed above, but it also has metaphysical elements, which have to do with the way in which Bacon conceived the structure of the physical world.

Everything that exists in nature, Bacon stated, was brought into existence by two causes, the efficient and the material cause. Every efficient cause, however,

acts through its own force which it produces in the matter subject to it, like the light of the sun produces its force in the air which is the light which is spread out throughout the world from the light of the sun. And this force is called likeness, image, species, and many other names, and this [force] produces substance as well as accident, both spiritual and corporeal […] Thus, agents’ forces like these bring about every operation in this world […] (OM IV, vol. 1, 111).

To understand physical agency brought about by efficient causes, however, requires mathematics because physical operations occur by means of forces, or species, like light, which operates through rays. Not only physical agency but psychic and astrological agency require mathematics as well to understand. For Bacon, light is an instance of physical agency through forces or species following the geometrical rules of reflection and refraction. It is a privileged case of such agency because of its visibility. Herein also lay the reason why the science of light and vision (perspective) is embedded in the theory of the multiplication of species. If a natural philosopher wants to explain natural processes, she must focus on lines of physical action and employ mathematical methods. Natural philosophy must follow the principle of motion and rest, which involves instances of change  and species following geometrical principles (OM IV, vol. 1, 110).

c. Bacon’s Theory of Physical Causation and Perspective

Bacon’s treatises De Multiplicatione Specierum and Perspectiva, comprising the fifth part of the Opus Maius, represent his scientific work at its best. Although Bacon was well-read on all of the new sciences presented in the course of the Latin medieval translation movement, he was most accomplished in the fields of light, vision, and the universal emanation of force. However, the actual extent of his accomplishments in this field has been the subject of a good deal of debate. Both the De Multiplicatione Specierum and the Perspectiva are available in modern critical editions and accompanied by English translations, prepared by David C. Lindberg.

In developing an account of physical causation in his doctrine of the multiplication of species, Bacon stood in a long tradition of philosophical and biblical writers who used light metaphors in different epistemological, metaphysical, and physical contexts. Although unknown during the Middle Ages, Plotinus’ doctrine of emanation—with its physical consequence that all beings radiate likenesses of themselves—had an indirect influence on Bacon’s physical doctrine of the multiplication of species, a physical doctrine of emanation, so to speak (Lindberg 1983, xxxix-xlii). The channels through which Plotinian and Neoplatonic ideas reached Bacon included Augustine, Arabic sources such as al-Kindī’s (d. c. 873) De Radiis and De Aspectibus, Avicebron’s (d. c. 1058) Fons Vitae and the Book of Causes (Liber de Causis) transmitting ideas from Proclus’ Elements of Theology. Next to the newly translated Aristotelian works, other important sources for Bacon’s doctrine of physical causation were treatises on more technical subjects such as Euclid’s Optica, Ptolemy’s Optica, and Alhazen’s De Aspectibus.

Among the first scholars to embrace this body of knowledge was Robert Grosseteste, whose influence on Bacon has been much debated. For Grosseteste’s influence on Bacon see Hackett, 1995 and 1997a. In any case, crucial for both Grosseteste and Bacon in their physical and metaphysical considerations was al-Kindī’s notion that  “every creature in the universe is a source of radiation and the universe itself a vast network of forces” (Lindberg, 1983, xlv). In al-Kindī, both Grosseteste and Bacon found a mathematical and physical analysis of the radiation of force, or physical agency, following the rules of geometrical optics. According to this analysis rays of light spread out by rectilinear propagation, reflection, and refraction. In a similar manner, the radiation of other kinds of species could also be understood along optico-geometrical lines. In comparison to al-Kindī and Grosseteste, Bacon’s achievement consisted in the naturalization of Grosseteste’s physics of light, “itself an outgrowth of al-Kindī’s universal radiation of force.” Bacon took Grosseteste’s doctrine out of its metaphysical and cosmogonical context and modified it to become a doctrine of physical causation (Lindberg, 1983, liv). In other words, in the De Multiplicatione Specierum Bacon brought forth a doctrine with which he was able to explain all kinds of physical causation—optical, astrological, and psychic—and to answer the question of how one physical object was able to affect another physical object even if they are not contiguous.

In Bacon’s view, the technical term species was not to be confused with Porphyry’s universal species . The former denotes the likeness or similitude of any naturally-acting thing, or its “first effect, ” as he called it (DMS, 2). What this implies is that a substance or quality is able to affect its surroundings by sending forth a likeness of itself in all directions unless obstructed—an activity which makes recipients of their likeness like themselves. By this process, natural agents impact others by means of forces bearing the specific nature of the original agent. Yet, this process of causation takes place without the original agent emitting something since this would result in its corruption, a possibility which Bacon excludes. Bacon emphasizes that instead of comprehending the process of the production of species in terms of emission or material emanation, as the ancient atomists did, it should be understood in terms of a transmission “through a natural alteration and bringing out of the potentiality of the matter of the recipient” (DMS, 45). For the physical nature of the species, this meant that they were generated in the recipient matter by a “bringing forth” (eductio), an elicitation “out of the recipient’s matter active potentiality” that already exists there (DMS, 47). In cases in which the agent and the recipient are contiguous, “the active substance of the agent, touching the substance of the recipient without intermediary, can alter, by its active virtue and power, the first part of the recipient it touches. And this action flows into the interior of that part, since the part is not a surface, but a body” (DMS, 52f). In cases in which this “bringing forth” could not be continuous because the agent and the effect are not contiguous, it occurs in a stepwise manner through a medium. In those cases, natural causation takes place in the form of successive generation or multiplication of species along straight or direct, reflected, refracted, twisting, or accidental lines. The species are multiplied step by step, beginning in a small section of a medium contiguous with the original agent, from whence it draws out its likeness in the next adjacent part, and so forth, until finally the last part of the medium ultimately superimposes the nature of the agent on the recipient. In the Perspectiva, the fifth part of the Opus maius, Bacon applied his doctrine of the multiplication of species to the subjects of the propagation of light and vision. Although much of Bacon’s account of vision was borrowed from Alhazen and other predecessors, Bacon synthesized that account into a form that became historically important. Indeed, it remained the standard account of visual theory until the work of Johannes Kepler (d. 1630) (Lindberg, 1997, 265).

In developing his doctrine of natural agency, Bacon drew principally on the optical tradition because he regarded light, acting by means of rays, as a paradigmatic case of physical causation. In fact, he thought of light as a privileged case because of its visibility—the radiation of force being like the sun (OM IV, vol. 1, 111). Inspired by Aristotle, Bacon stated that we know everything through vision, and perspective is the science of vision by means of which one can understand the structure and laws of the universe (OT, chapt. xi, 36f.). Perspective became Bacon’s model science for physical causation and was, compared to all the other sciences, especially significant for human understanding of the world. According to Bacon, because the radiation of light follows the geometrical principles of rectilinear propagation, reflection, and refraction, it employs mathematical methods and involves the possibility of geometrical demonstration, what Bacon considered an “experiment”; moreover, it is a subdivision of mathematics. As far as Bacon’s accomplishments in this field are concerned, it is commonly agreed that he was one of the leading Western proponents of the doctrine of the multiplication of species. It was Bacon, “more than any other author in the Latin world, who taught Europeans how to think about light, vision, and the emanation of force ”  (Lindberg, 1997, 244).

d. Experimental Science

Following Aristotle, Bacon held that “all humans by nature desire to know” and are naturally drawn towards the beauty of wisdom and carried away by their love for it. Bacon emphasized that to ensure success in learning, it is necessary to first inquire into the method best suited for it, as there are better and worse ways to proceed in the sciences. In his Compendium Studii Philosophiae (CSP), Bacon distinguished between three ways of acquiring knowledge—knowledge through authority, reason, and experience—and he made it clear that not all three ways are of equal value. Neither authority nor reason are sufficient for knowledge because reliance on authority alone yielded belief but not understanding, while reason alone could not distinguish between true sentences and sentences having only the appearance of knowledge (CSP, ch. i, 396f). According to Bacon, achieving knowledge requires three things: (1) to heed the structure of the scientific material and to begin with what is first, easier, and more general then proceed to what is later, more difficult, and more particular, (2) to proceed using the clearest possible words without causing confusion, and (3) to reach a level of certainty that leaves behind all doubt. For this, Bacon considered it crucial to employ experience, and, in regard to the order of learning, to precede experience with mathematics. Thus, the only way for the human mind to arrive at the full truth, and to rest in the contemplation of truth, is through experience, a subjective comprehension based on sense perception. Bacon believed that experimental science (scientia experimentalis) was virtually unknown to the “rank and file of students;” thus he thought it necessary to present to the Pope its “powers and properties.” Bacon thus laid out his theory of experiential knowledge in the sixth part of Opus Maius, presenting scientia experimentalis as the penultimate science, second only to moral philosophy (OM VI, vol. 2, 172).

Many of Bacon’s writings bear witness to his concern not only for the content of knowledge (that is, the available material), but also the quality of the knowledge acquired (ideally, conclusions should be held in a manner that penetrates and reassures the soul and leaves it in a state of certainty and free of doubt). Thus, when Bacon said that “[…] nothing can be sufficiently known without experience,” he meant to emphasize the role that individual sense perception (and especially vision) plays in the process of learning. (OM VI, vol. 2, 167) For Bacon, learning denotes not only the process of the acquisition of knowledge, but also the process of the restoration of wisdom that was given by God at the beginning of time and subsequently lost through sin (see Section 2a). Therefore, experiential knowledge is of fundamental importance in Bacon’s project of the reform of studies. Its importance and utility extended far beyond the theoretical sphere, encompassing progress in applied science and technology, and ideally leading to broad improvements in both Church and State.

i. Experience and Experiment

The meaning of the Latin term experimentum is ‘test’ or ‘trial.’ Bacon used this term to cover a variety of testing practices, such as first-hand and second-hand sensory experience and the inner, spiritual experience of divine illumination. Experimentum also was used to refer to various kinds of practical knowledge that are more or less connected to empirical practice. The notion of experience or experiments as a basis for induction, that is, for inferences based on observation, was familiar to Bacon, but in the context of advancing scientific understanding he did not seem to attach much importance to it. In his attempts to discover the cause of the rainbow, however, there are some inductive elements (Fisher and Unguru, 1971, 376).

In his concept of scientia experimentalis, Bacon did not only consider experience through external senses, through vision, for example. His understanding was firmly grounded within the Augustinian tradition in affirming another kind of experience next to those provided by the external senses. Experience that consists in “internal illumination” (OM VI, vol. 2, 169). For Bacon, experience through the external senses does not completely suffice to provide certainty in regard to physical bodies, “because of its difficulty,” and it does not achieve anything in the realm of spiritual things. The ancient patriarchs and prophets received their scientific knowledge by way of this divinely granted internal illumination. Thus, experience-based knowledge according to Bacon was twofold: philosophical and divine. The philosophical was rooted in external senses and the divine was rooted in divine inspiration occurring internally (OM VI, vol. 2, 169-172).

ii. The Three Prerogatives of Experimental Science

The goal of the major section of the sixth part of the Opus Maius was to outline the different dimensions of the value and utility of scientia experimentalis. In his theory, Bacon explicitly and carefully distinguished three different “prerogatives” or functions of scientia experimentalis, each producing its own peculiar result. Bacon’s usage of the name scientia experimentalis referred not to one but to three different things, each being useful for the restoration of learning, yet in different ways. Scientia experimentalis was both an instrument used within other sciences like mathematics or alchemy and a science in its own right. Scientia experimentalis experientially confirms or refutes the theoretical conclusions of other sciences, first dignity; it provides observations and instruments needed for empirical practice, second dignity, and it actively investigates the secrets of nature, third dignity. Modernly speaking one can say that by dividing scientia experimentalis into three dignities, Bacon acknowledged the difference that exists between science and technology.

The first prerogative or dignity of scientia experimentalis, according to Bacon, was aimed at the conclusions of the other sciences (OM VI, vol. 2, 172-201). With this dignity, Bacon’s goal was not to render conclusions logically consistent with one another, but rather experientially test or challenge theoretical claims to knowledge and thereby aid in the process of attaining doubt-free, certain knowledge. . Thus, in its first dignity, scientia experimentalis puts universal theoretical claims to the test by confronting them with the actual experiential objects. It thereby completes science’s search for truth and certitude. Certitude, in turn, is a function of the way by which knowledge is acquired and describes the state in which the human mind has a direct intuition of an experiential object. According to Bacon, this dignity of scientia experimentalis also includes mathematical conclusions, which cannot be fully known based on demonstrations alone since they lack reference to concrete experiential particulars. In his discussion of the rainbow and the halo in the sixth part of Opus Maius, Bacon gave a detailed illustration of this function of scientia experimentalis. In particular, by referring to observation and the application of the laws of perspective, Bacon attempted to provide a causal account of the appearance of the rainbow (Lindberg, 1966; Hackett, 1997b, 285-306).

The second prerogative also situates scientia experimentalis as an instrument within the other sciences.  Yet it is not related to experience as a source of knowledge or certitude as described in the first dignity. In its second function, experimental knowledge serves the purpose of developing the other speculative sciences to their fullest potential by venturing into the unknown and the occult through experimental practice involving instruments. Scientia experimentalis, for Bacon, becomes a tool utilized in the other sciences through its ability to discover truths hidden in these sciences—truths whose unearthing went beyond the competence of those sciences. For example, although human life and health belong to the science of medicine, scientia experimentalis goes beyond the field of medicine by seeking out means by which to prolong life (OM VI, vol. 2, 202).

In the third prerogative Bacon gave scientia experimentalis the status of a science within its own right, independent of the other sciences. Experimental science investigates the secrets of nature by its own power. Its function includes the acquisition of knowledge of the future, past, and present in which it even exceeds astrology, and the accomplishment of marvelous works such as the manufacturing of antidotes against animal poisons or technologies that could be used in warfare. (OM VI, vol. 2, 215-219)

iii. Bacon as Experimenter

In many respects, Bacon's experimental practice was not as  sophisticated and strategic as his theory of scientia experimentalis.   It is the general verdict arrived at by scholars that Bacon did not live up to his promise of the application of experimental methods. Bacon’s accomplishment as experimenter has been criticized for many reasons including his silence on the concrete question of how to conduct the experiments in practice outlined by him in theory. In regard to perspective, it has been pointed out that while Bacon’s theories were not primarily the result of his own experimental practice, he still engaged in some experimental practice that went beyond simple, everyday observation, like in the case of the rainbow where he performed more complex observations. These observations have been described as “geometrical tests” (Lindberg, 1997, 268-271). Bacon’s experimental practice also encompassed observations that were supposed to supply empirical data requiring explanations in the context of existing theories, for example when employing the rules of refraction to explain the rod that appears bent upon partially being submerged in water. The most usual function of experiment and experience, though, consisted in the verification of theoretical claims made by the other speculative sciences.

e. Alchemy and Medicine

Apart from experimental science, the other science in which Bacon’s practical, secular concerns became manifest was alchemy—the science of the “generation of things” from the four elements. Unsurprisingly, alchemy occupies a very high position in Bacon’s reform of studies. He presented his “alchemical manifesto” (Newman, 1997, 319) as part of the Opus Tertium and at the end of the Opus Minus (OT, ch. xii, 39-43; OMi, 359-389). Apart from the papal opera, there were in addition a few other works dealing with alchemical-medical questions, such as the De Erroribus Medicorum and the Liber Sex Scientiarum in 3° Gradu Sapientie. In Bacon’s judgment, alchemy needed an advocate because natural philosophers and the common run of students were ignorant of the true potential of alchemy. Due to the interconnectedness of the sciences, ignorance of alchemy was to the detriment of speculative and practical medicine, which in turn affected the very general state of human affairs. For Bacon’s views on alchemy see Newman 1997.

Because alchemy was on the blacklist of ecclesiastical authorities, it was necessary for Bacon to carefully qualify his understanding of alchemy and to thoroughly differentiate it from magic. Bacon attempted to do this in his Epistola de Secretis Operibus Artis et Naturae, et de Nullitate Magiae. Against magical practices that relied on the help of evil demons, Bacon argued that alchemy relied on the powers of science, which operated in accordance with nature by artificially employing and directing the potential latent in nature. Bacon argued that the powers of the sciences even surpassed those of nature when in their practice they used natural powers as their instruments. In effect Bacon claimed that alchemical theory would provide the necessary naturalization of seemingly magical natural processes (Epistola de Secretis Operibus, 523).

As was common for his approach in organizing the sciences, Bacon divided alchemy into two branches, one speculative and the other practical. Speculative alchemy teaches the generation of things from the four elements (fire, air, water, and earth). What arises from the elements, Bacon argued, are things like metals, salts, or precious stones, and two types of humors: the “simple” humors (blood, phlegm, and black and yellow bile) and the “compound” humors of the same names. Practical alchemy, on the other hand, applies those theoretical insights for the purposes of, say, manufacturing various items of chemical technology like precious metals or pigments (OT, ch. xii, 40).

The notion that the interplay of the humors directs human vital processes and that the alchemist has the ability to analyze and transmute material substances, based on the belief in the transmutability of the proportions of humors, lead Bacon to call for practical action. He wanted the so-called philosophers’ stone and the universal remedy, Panacea, to be produced with alchemy. In general, he thought alchemy should be applied to medicine, which, during his time, was a “significant novelty” (Newman, 1997, 335). In the course of his alchemical work, Bacon assigned two roles to alchemy in medicine. The first role consisted in purifying ordinary pharmaceuticals, and the second role concerned prolonging human life to its utmost. Bacon believed that the shortness of people’s lives during his time was due not to divine plan, but to bad health regimens. Over time, these regimes had corrupted human complexion. Because this corruption arose from natural causes it was susceptible to natural remedies that would help to reestablish “equal complexion,” that is, a state of incorruptibility where the elemental qualities of a substance existed in perfect harmony according to their virtue and active power.  In Bacon’s mind, nature, with the help of alchemy, could produce the same result by applying appropriate means.

The secular trajectory of Bacon’s reductio artium and his “utilitarian” scientific outlook emerged in  the most pronounced form in Bacon’s work in medical alchemy. Even though Bacon’s attempt to combine alchemy and medicine under the aegis of experimental science did not have a major impact on his contemporaries, “it did at least foreshadow the development of a medical alchemy in the following century” (Newman, 1997, 335).

5. Moral Philosophy

a. General Scope and Nature of Bacon’s Moral Philosophy

Roger Bacon presented his main thoughts and arguments on morality and human moral agency in a piece entitled Moralis Philosophia (MP), which formed the seventh and last part of the Opus Maius (1266–1268). As such, the Moralis Philosophia marked the culmination of Bacon’s proposals on the reform of the studies of language and the sciences commissioned by Pope Clement IV. The Moralis Philosophia is available in a modern critical edition prepared by Eugenio Massa (1953). A short résumé of the main elements of Bacon’s moral philosophy is contained in the Opus Tertium, chapters xiv, xv, and lxxv.

i. Morality and Happiness

Generally speaking, Bacon’s moral reflections were built on the assumption that the end or goal of human life (finis hominis) is happiness and that human moral practice in the form of virtuous agency is a decisive factor in humans’ attainment of happiness. For a human being, the proper way to live is in a human manner and, as Bacon said, “virtue is the life of a human being” (MP III, §§1-4, 50f). Bacon understood happiness to be synonymous with salvation and believed philosophy and faith are both indispensable for its attainment. On the nature of happiness, true philosophy and the principles of Christian faith are in complete agreement. Thus the topic around which Bacon’s main practical and normative concerns in moral philosophy revolved was human moral agency. This took three specific forms: (1) human moral practice in relation to God, (2) human moral practice in relation to one’s neighbor in the form of social relations, and (3) human moral practice in relation to persons themselves in the form of virtue or vice. Bacon’s moral philosophy was normative in the sense that it concretely prescribed the details of these relations, and practical in the sense that it exhorted agents to live according to these moral principles and laws (MP I, §4, 4).

Next to the concept of happiness, the idea of the utility of the sciences for humankind was an ever-present concern for Bacon. According to Bacon, all of the sciences presented in the Opus Maius are, in one way or the other, useful for human beings in providing the theoretical and practical means necessary for a better life. The way in which a science is important can be spelled out either in the worldly sense of being able to procure an amelioration of everyday life, or—and in this sense related to the secular and the divine—as contributing to achieving happiness. Since moral philosophy is the only science concerned with morally relevant human agency, and human moral agency is directly related to the attaining of happiness, which is the highest goal or end of human beings, moral philosophy is the highest science. Thus Bacon’s concern with the utility of the sciences was expanded to include a moral dimension insofar as moral philosophy guides humans in virtuous action.

ii. The Place of Moral Philosophy within the Hierarchy of Sciences

Because meritorious human practice is connected to human happiness, it follows that sciences like grammar, mathematics, or geography are not value-neutral activities but crucial instruments in humans’ pursuit of the highest good (summum bonum). Thus within philosophy, moral reflection is a distinct, yet not isolated task, and it informed Bacon’s treatments of language, mathematics, optics and experimental science insofar as it orients them towards human perfection and happiness. In Bacon’s hierarchy of the sciences, moral philosophy is the highest science. Even experimental science, which Bacon favored so much, is only penultimate. Moral philosophy uses the results and conclusions of the other sciences, for example the truths that were established about celestial bodies in astronomy, for its principles and starting points. All other sciences are subordinate to moral philosophy (MP, Part I, §6, 4). While in themselves all the sciences on Bacon’s agenda had their own distinctive subject matters and objects, their shared overall purpose, the improvement of human life, represents a unifying factor.

Another significant feature of Bacon’s conception of moral philosophy concerns the way in which he attempted to solve a problem prominent in the 13th century. Contemporaries were concerned with the ethical value of speculation (theoria), in particular, metaphysics, the speculative science par excellence, and the status of speculative statements about God and spiritual substances. Bacon approached these issues from a teleological, ethical angle. For him, the supreme way of human life consists in moral practice, the highest expression of which is love of God practiced in worship (cultus dei). Although metaphysics and moral philosophy are related in the sense that they share their subject matter,  including subjects like God, immortality, and happiness, they are methodologically distinct. Metaphysics deals with these topics speculatively, that is, in a fundamental manner (principaliter) and in general (in universali), whereas moral philosophy deals with them practically, that is, from the point of view of their concrete practical implications (in particulari). While metaphysics asks whether there is a God or whether the human soul is immortal, moral philosophy assumes the affirmative metaphysical conclusions as its principles in order to deduce from them content related to the particular, concrete sphere of human agency. While for Bacon moral philosophy is completely dependent upon metaphysical speculation, metaphysical speculation is still entirely subordinated to moral philosophy because, from a teleological point of view, speculation ranks lower than moral practice in regard to the highest good and because of the limitations of metaphysical speculation with regard to moral matters. Thus metaphysical speculation is not an end in itself; rather, its end consists in catering to the needs of moral philosophy.  By virtue of its relation to metaphysics, moral philosophy is prevented from diminishing into a mere discrete, action-guiding skill, but rather retains its scientific character (MP, ch. I, 7-9). The reason for the moral philosopher’s competence to amplify metaphysical conclusions, such as those involving creation or the Trinity, was grounded in Bacon’s conviction that philosophers share in divine revelation and illumination (OM II, vol. 3, 44-50). In his answer to the question of the status of speculative statements about the divine, Bacon drew strongly from Avicenna’s conception of the relation between moral philosophy, civil science, and metaphysics, as presented in his final book, Liber de Philosophia Prima.

Bacon perceived no competition between moral philosophy and theology. Bacon stated very clearly that theology, the primary discipline concerned with sacred Scriptures, addresses the same topics as moral philosophy albeit in a different manner, namely “in the faith of Christ” (MP I, §5, 4). According to Bacon, philosophy is not ancillary to theology in the sense that any philosophical endeavor would culminate in theology, as proposed by the contemporary Reduction of Arts to Theology, written by Bacon’s Minister General Bonaventure. Rather, Bacon emphasized that both theology and philosophy are results of divine revelation and illumination. Secondly, philosophy is superior to theology in some respects. for example in matters pertaining to morality and virtue. Therefore theology could not lead humans to salvation without the substantial aid of philosophy. In Bacon’s model of knowledge, the ultimate goals of both theology and philosophy are subordinate to the highest good of a beatific union with God. In relation to philosophy, the object of theology is to amplify the wisdom provided by philosophy by adding the decisive teleological element in regard to human meritorious agency. In Bacon’s view, theology, like moral philosophy, is a practical science, dealing with human salvation “in the faith of Christ.” Philosophy, on the other hand, operates within the limitations of natural reason, rather than “in the faith of Christ.” Although it  informs “our actions in this life and in the other life,” in itself it cannot promote full, future happiness. Philosophical contemplative practice cannot bring about happiness or salvation (MP I, §2, 3).

iii. Practical Sciences and Human Practice

The manner in which Bacon reflected on the concept of human “practice” in the beginning of the MP suggests that the concept “practical science” was very important for Bacon’s philosophy. The way in which Bacon used the term bears modern connotations insofar as for him it implied the notions of utility and power for humans—for example, to improve or to ameliorate human lives in view of diseases or the process of aging. As Bacon pointed out, “some sciences are active and operative […]. They are about artificial and natural works, and consider the truths of things and scientific works that relate to the speculative intellect” (MP I, §2, 3). Thus, in Bacon’s understanding, a practical science had secular relevance in that it has the capacity of explaining and producing things through speculative efforts. This idea of practical he associated especially with experimental science, as described in great detail in the sixth part of the Opus Maius. However, Bacon further qualified the notion of human practice by pointing towards the relevance it had for human life in the other world, namely life after death. In this sense, the term practical acquired a narrower meaning.

According to Bacon, the term practical refers to a kind of human practice that has a connection to humans’ highest end (finis hominis) and to becoming good, to their acquiring the virtues of justice or modesty. These “works” of humans constitute moral agency properly speaking and represent the works by virtue of which characters or souls are judged as good or evil. Those works are works of moral conduct (opera moris). They consist in the performance of what is considered good or evil and are directed by the practical intellect intending and striving for the good. Accordingly, a practical science, taken in the narrower sense of the term, is a science of human action from the point of view of the distinction between good and evil, virtuous and vicious, and happiness and misery in the next life. Thus, in a wider sense, the term practical refers to human works, and practical science refers to the sciences directing their effort towards works, activity, and production. Yet, as Bacon emphasized, taken in a narrower sense, as in the context of moral philosophy, practical refers strictly to works of moral conduct as related to the practical intellect and human will (MP I, § 3, 3).

iv. The Functional Division of Moral Philosophy

The overall goal of moral philosophy, according to Bacon, is practical and directed towards human moral agency. With regard to the general structure of moral philosophy (sensu stricto), Bacon distinguished between two branches, a speculative or theoretical branch (speculativa), and a practical branch (practica). The former deals with subjects in a speculative manner—concerning, originally, metaphysical truths that have moral implications relating to the existence of God or God’s unity and trinity, as well as laws and virtues.  The practical branch, on the other hand, seeks engagement in human affairs. Under this branch the moral philosopher is concerned with active moral work, namely with moral persuasion, be that of unbelievers or the morally “paralyzed,” as Bacon describes the Christian whose will is corrupt or whose nature is too irascible to be made continent easily (MP V, §§1-2, 247).

Bacon likened this “division of labor” between the speculative and the practical parts of moral philosophy to the art of medicine which, like moral philosophy and all the other sciences, has a speculative and a practical branch. For Bacon, the practical part of moral philosophy is related to the speculative in a similar manner as, in medicine. The practical part of medicine isconcerned with the active healing of the sick and the preservation of health,) and is related to the theoretical part, concerning which concerns what health is, which diseases and symptoms there are, or what their remedies are. The main difference between both parts consists in the kind of knowledge the theoretically and practically versed expert possesses. While the theorist’s knowledge is essentially book knowledge,  consisting of generalized facts and second-hand authority, the practitioner’s knowledge is skill-based, rooted in first-hand experience with particular cases.  These experiences produce knowledge that allows for practical, read, operational, application to “induce humans to moral action.” According to Bacon, both the speculative and practical branches of moral philosophy have as common subject matters those subjects that are practical (operabilia) and are the highest truths about God and worship, eternal life, laws of justice and peace, and the virtues. The practice of moral philosophy, in Bacon’s understanding, can be likened to a kind of therapy, a spiritual-psychological healing, in which the patient (the human soul) is aided in the preservation of spiritual health and healed in case of spiritual disease (sin) (MP V, §§4-11, 248f). With regard to the division of moral philosophy, one can say that Bacon’s overall motto followed the famous Aristotelian principle from the second book of the Nicomachean Ethics, according to which the end of examining questions of virtue and happiness is not pursued for its own sake but rather in order “to become good.”

Bacon subsequently divided each of the two branches of moral philosophy into three sub-branches. The three parts of the speculative branch comprise the first three parts of the Moralis Philosophia. The first part presents a kind of “metaphysical groundwork or morals,” listing morally relevant metaphysical principles, like the existence of God, from which Bacon argued that it is possible to “unfold” (explicare) or expound any implied normative moral content. The second part of the speculative branch of moral philosophy deals with morality insofar as it pertains to the relations between the individuals and their fellow beings; this part, however, remains very brief, consisting mostly of quotations from Avicenna’s Metaphysics, outlining a structure of social life. Lastly, in the third part Bacon dealt with the topic of virtues and vices, predominantly by quoting from and recounting the moral works of the ancient Roman Stoic Seneca and also including some Cicero. Bacon had a special appreciation for Seneca. He considered Seneca’s moral teaching on virtues and vices as superior to the teaching of Christian thinkers (MP III.5, §1, 132). Bacon’s own account of the virtues and vices was influenced by both Aristotle’s and Stoic views on virtue. He adopted the Aristotelian doctrine of virtues of character being a mean and combined it with the Stoic doctrine of affects.  Accordingly, Bacon greatly emphasized tranquility. Without tranquility of mind, one could not tolerate adversities with ease or attain happiness.  Bacon also devoted particular attention to the vice of wrath. It has been argued that this part of Moralis Philosophia was composed as a moral handbook for the Prince and Prelate, advising the Pope about the existence and nature of Seneca’s Dialogues, which had been unknown north of the Alps until 1266 (Hackett, 1997, 407). This circumstance again illustrates the practical trajectory of Bacon’s philosophy, where “practical” is to be understood both in the sense of utility and of moral persuasiveness.

The “therapeutic” or practical task of moral philosophy, on the other hand, is contained in parts four to six of the Moralis Philosophia. All of these parts share the goal of helping to “induce humans to moral action,” that is, to persuade people of the morals contained in the works of secular philosophers, mainly Aristotle and Seneca and in the works of the Christian tradition. Bacon divided the three sub-branches of philosophy in accordance with their three distinct goals: (1) faith (MP part four), (2) moral practice (MP part five), and (3) forensic judgment (MP part six). Parts four to six of the Moralis Philosophia were “practical” in the sense that in each case, the “patient” or addressee is to be persuaded of either (1) the credibility of the right, Christian law (lex christiana), (2) the love and fulfillment of the law once she believed it, or (3) the “right” side in a complex legal case. Thus moral philosophy in its three practical sub-branches deals, according to Bacon, with different kinds of “patients”—Christians as well as Infidels. It employs different practical methods, including rhetorical and poetical arguments, in order to prove the validity of the religion and persuade people of it.

b. Moral Philosophy in the Service of Human Moral Agency

Bacon intended moral reflection to serve the salvific interests of humankind. He conceived of it, as we have seen, as “practical” in a double sense. On one hand, moral philosophy is human moral practice dealt with from a speculative point of view, consisting in the contemplation and proof or moral truths and ultimately directed towards practical guidance. On the other hand, moral philosophy is practical in that it involves the active effort to induce people to act morally (opus morale) by employing rhetorical and poetical arguments. The addressees of moral persuasion are, for Bacon, non-Christians and those Christians suffering from mental insanity or those who are morally “paralyzed” because of a corrupt will. In either of those cases, Bacon’s eye was directed towards human happiness and the religious, social, and personal implications of human moral agency for attaining that happiness. Because Bacon understood human practice to be establishing a relation to God through worship, to others in society, and to the individual self, being good for Bacon means to act virtuously in all of these relations. The purpose and utility of the practical branch of moral philosophy consists in producing the corresponding attitudes towards God, one’s neighbor, and oneself through the use of rhetorical and poetical arguments. Hence, moral persuasion was divided according to what pertains to the moral practice of faith (credendum), action (operandum), and correct judgment (recte iudicandum), and in this consists its service to humankind (MP V.2, §8, 251).

i. The Conversion of Non-Christians

The fourth part of Moralis Philosophia, which deals with the conversion of non-Christians, has a close connection to the fourth part of Opus Maius, on mathematics.  Bacon relied on the astrological theories he previously outlined in his mathematical reflections in Opus Maiusto create an account of the different religious sects (sectae) in Moralis Philosophia.. The systematic background for applying mathematics to religious matters was based on Bacon’s theory of science, according to which all sciences are related on a deeper genealogical level insofar as they all have divine origin and thus share the goal of serving or facilitating humanity’s pursuit of the highest good. Furthermore, according to Bacon, the speculative sciences, directed at contemplating truths, are subordinate to the practical sciences, which aim at the good. The good as an end of action is superior to truth as the end of speculation. Bacon defined this hierarchical relationship in terms of utility (MP V.2, §5, 251).

For Bacon, the mathematical sciences, of which astronomy-astrology is one, are useful in secular as well as divine matters. For theology, for example, Bacon briefly describes seven areas for the application of mathematics, including the location of hell and paradise (geography) or the course of human history since creation (chronology) (OM IV, 175ff). With regard to astronomy in general, it had been a widely circulated idea among medieval thinkers that astronomy is of immediate relevance to the human situation—and thus to moral philosophy—because, as was generally accepted at that time, the motions and natures of celestial bodies by means of rays affected sublunar processes and bodies. According to Bacon, judicial astronomy (astrology) in particular is useful. With respect to the present, judicial astronomy indicated that and what kind of peculiar moral influence each planet has on terrestrial animate and inanimate bodies. He believed this knowledge was useful for the work of moral persuasion (OM IV, vol. 1, 253-269). Thus moral and sociological issues such as temperament or character, forms of social organization and kinds of rulership, were held by Bacon to be dependent on astronomical constellations. For example, the constellations of Jupiter and Mars had religious significance in that they pointed to the supremacy of Christian faith or the coming of the Antichrist. Bacon not only believed individuals to be affected by constellations or climate, but whole communities as well. Thus the true astronomer can make conjectures based on manners and customs, which in turn are dependent on temperament and climate. Bacon believed this was why moral philosophy should consider astronomy-astrology in its work of converting infidels.

In accordance with astronomical-astrological findings, Bacon stated in his MP that there are six main sects, or social constitutions (lex), among which he listed Sarracens, Tartars, Pagans, Idolaters, Jews, and Christians (MP IV, §4, 189). With regard to the practical task of moral philosophy, Bacon considered its first goal to be the conversion of these sects, the “bending of the souls” of non-Christians so that they would receive and believe the truths of Christianity. Bacon held that the means by which they should be persuaded of the truth of Christianity were those common to all people. Rather than appeal to Christian authorities, the arguments employed should appeal to natural reason. Bacon recommended this conversion through language, essentially rhetoric, as being worth more than any war or “conversion through the sword” (OM III, vol. 2, 120-122).

ii. Moral Works and Eloquence

From Bacon’s point of view, the human need of moral persuasion was evident not only from contact of Christians with non-Christians, but also in the corrupt state of society. Bacon believed societal corruption was a reflection of curricular deficiencies, the deficiency being that they were taught grammar and formal logic rather than rhetoric and poetics. Bacon acknowledged that moral works—consisting of the acquisition of virtuous character traits, willing compliance with civil laws, and religious worship—were very difficult to achieve.  Indeed, he considered them much more difficult than the grasp of scientific subjects (MP V.3, §2, 254). The two reasons for human obtuseness in relation to moral works are, first, that moral works in themselves have a higher degree of difficulty than the scientific empirical subjects because of their being insensible, that is, intelligible only. Secondly, and more importantly, human will is corrupt and does not enjoy the execution of such works. Human will is drawn to sensible and temporal pleasures more than to eternal and insensible pleasures. Our will (affectus), Bacon added, resembles a paralytic who cannot perceive the delicious food placed in front of him. Failure to act morally is thus a failure of intention rather than cognitive inability. Since virtue and happiness are more important than individual scientific advancement and since some people must be persuaded of moral action, Bacon assigned the task of moral persuasion to the practical branch of moral philosophy.

For effective moral persuasion, Bacon identified a kind of “speech capable of swaying the human mind,” a way of speaking to people that takes into account basic facts of human psychology. Because moral agency depends on factors such as desire, will, motivation, and prudence—which are all associated with the practical intellect—the arguments employed in moral persuasion must be capable of appealing to the practical intellect and strong enough to remedy against “moral paralysis.” The arguments not only had to be taught but had to captivate listeners’ attention and arouse in them love for the good (MP V.2, §1, 250). In the process of identifying the adequate means for moral persuasion, Bacon excluded the two traditional, scientific forms of argument: dialectical and demonstrative arguments. Despite acceding to the view that only demonstrative arguments move the intellect towards knowledge of truths, Bacon held that the fact of being moved by means of argument towards knowing the truth about a subject is not sufficient for inducing humans to love the good and to act in accordance with it. For Bacon, arousing a love for the good that would result in action requires a kind of truth-bearing argument that appeals to the practical intellect. Human emotions and desires must participate rather than the speculative intellect, which is limited only to grasping truths and not involved in moral practice. The proper argument in the context of human moral and civil affairs engendered action. Thus, according to Bacon, moral persuasion was inseparable from the principles of eloquence through which a hearer was rendered docile, benevolent, and attentive (MP V.2, §8, 251). By means of pleasing words, a hearer’s soul can be carried away and swayed towards the good. These “pleasing words” encompass, for example, rhetoric and poetics as found in Horace. In matters pertaining to justice, the virtues, happiness, and faith, in which the appeal to emotions, desires, and hope is so decisive, Bacon believed that rhetoric and poetics are much more appropriate than demonstrations or dialectical arguments. For these reasons, as Bacon pointed out to the Pope, the disappearance of rhetoric and poetics from the curricula and the inability of students to compose such arguments posed a problem to society as a whole (OM I, vol. III, 33).

iii. Rhetoric and Poetics as Branches of Moral Philosophy

In identifying rhetorical and poetical arguments as the proper instruments for moral persuasion, Bacon did not work in vacuo but was inspired by Greek and Arabic sources as well by Augustine’s De Doctrina Christiana and connected with this by the practice of preaching and Scriptural hermeneutics.

For Bacon, Aristotle was the undisputed master of rhetoric and poetics. He explicitly credited Aristotle’s brief remarks in the Nichomachean Ethics (1094b, 19-27), stating that the moral philosopher should use rhetoric rather than geometric proof. In the same breath, however, he lamented that current knowledge of both Aristotle’s Rhetoric and Poetics was lacking. The first complete translation of the Poetics was prepared in the 1280s by William Moerbecke. Without direct knowledge of Aristotle’s Poetics, Bacon had to rely on Averroes’ Commentary on the Poetics.

By comparison, Bacon regarded the Ciceronian Rhetoric (De Inventione and the pseudo-Ciceronian Rhetorica ad Herenium) as deficient in practical matters because it was restricted to cases of forensic oratory (MP, V.2, §7, 251). Apart from Aristotle and Augustine, another important reference for Bacon that demonstrated the connection between rhetoric and ethical and civil concerns was the Arabic tradition of writings, including Avicenna’s Logic, Algazel’s Treatise on Logic, and especially al-Farabi’s De Scientiis, chapter five (De Scientia Civili et Scientia Legis et Scientia Elocutionis) (CM, 16f; Rosier-Catach, 1998).  Bacon’s presentation and commendation of rhetoric and poetics can be regarded as an important historical contribution. Bacon not only criticized their omission from university curricula but also defended them against the charges of sophistry. Instead of counting rhetoric and poetics as part of the Trivium, he situated their use and utility within the context of moral philosophy for the purpose of moral persuasion. In a truly original manner, Bacon combined two distinct spheres of discourse, namely the artistic milieu represented by the Arabic tradition with the theological tradition represented in Augustine.  He also sowed the seeds for a significant step in the history of rhetoric and poetics, which consisted of acknowledging that while the principles of teaching how to compose rhetorical arguments are situated within logic, the particular use of rhetoric is a function of moral philosophy (rhetorica docens and utens) (OT, ch. lxxv, 308). In subsequent 13th century discussion, Giles of Rome further developed this potential of Aristotelian rhetoric in relation to ethical matters in his Commentary on the Rhetoric (1280s).

As far as the particulars of Bacon’s conception of rhetoric are concerned, he proposed a division of rhetoric corresponding to the threefold division of the practical branch of moral philosophy into faith, action, and correct judgment. For each kind of persuasion, there is a corresponding rhetorical technique (triplex flexus) (MP V.2, §7, 251). In the case of faith and the true religion, the adequate kind of persuasion involves assent and proof. While in cases of correct judgment, the kind of rhetoric needed is forensic oratory, which is based on Cicero’s rhetoric. These two parts Bacon regarded as “rhetoric absolutely speaking.”  Yet “swaying” people toward moral action that avoids evil and pursues the good requires stronger remedies. The kind of argument to be used, Bacon said, is properly called “poetic argument.” Thus poetics, according to Bacon, represents the third kind of rhetorical argument and thereby forms an integral part of moral philosophy (MP V.3, §6f., 254f). However, as Bacon pointed out, not all poetry is commendable. There are poets, like Ovidius, whose use of poetically skillful speech incite frivolity rather than virtue, and who, in a certain sense, misuse eloquence by reducing it to delectation. In comparison, the duty of a rhetorician is not to only please but to teach and to sway. The criterion according to which one can distinguish between the good and the shady poets is whether the respective poet only amuses or whether his poetry goes beyond amusement to sway people to good rather than to frivolous action. Poetry’s truthfulness and commendability consist in its practical usefulness.

All three kinds of rhetoric, as Bacon presented them, appeal to the practical intellect and are grounded in the idea that through “powerful speech” a speaker is able to make contact with a listener on some emotional level. The difference between the first two kinds of rhetoric, forensic rhetoric and rhetoric used in situations of religious persuasion, and the third kind, moral persuasion that engendered action, is one of style. Bacon distinguished between three styles: humble, moderate, and grand style. He placed most emphasis on the grand style and ascribed it to poetics because poetics involves “speaking of great and magnificent things.” By using the grand style, poetical argument moves the listener affectively and effectively to moral action (MP V.3, §11f, 256). For efficiency’s sake, Bacon insisted that grandiloquence must dominate in poetics. He also advocated mixing the styles, since moral persuasion also entails moral education and a variety of styles aid in not letting tediousness slip in. Bacon explained that the grand style involved an analogical (similitudo) use of language, illustrating it by giving examples. A knowledge of the properties of things, like light for example, broadens the orator’s semantic range of words and augments the moral message conveyed through argument. A sinner who after penance reverts to sin, as Bacon borrowed from the New Testament, is like “a dog which returns to his own vomit.” The veracity of such kinds of arguments, is not grounded in the properties of things: a person is obviously not a dog. Rather, the statements made in analogical arguments are true by way of similitude, comparison, and analogy and true for the purpose of persuasion (MP V.3, §16f, 257). In suggesting this approach in using language for moral persuasion, Bacon relied on principles of Scriptural hermeneutics. An accurate interpretation of the spiritual meaning of Scripture presupposes an accurate understanding of the literal text, which, in turn, presupposes an understanding of the natural world. In other words, knowledge of nature is subordinate to and useful in theology as well as in moral philosophy. In addition to using the grand style, Bacon suggested including into the repertoire of moral persuasion not only linguistic means of “moving the ears” but sensitivity to the nature and situation of the respective audience. Rhetoricians should be mindful of “movement of the mind and appropriate bodily gesture” (MP V.3, §20, 258). Thus practical moral discourse is capable of effectively touching human sentiment. Bacon’s reflections took into account the different dimensions of practical moral discourse, ranging from rhythm and intonation over content to the body language of the speaker.

6. Conclusion

Many of Roger Bacon’s works still require critical editions and systematic and historical examination, throwing a wrench into any attempt at a final conclusion about his accomplishments in philosophy. Perhaps because of this circumstance, perhaps because of the brilliance of some of his educational ideas, or perhaps because of his strategic scientific vision, which always aimed at the improvement of human life, his scientific legacy continues to draw the attention of intellectual historians—even if Bacon did not appeal to his own contemporaries.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Bibliographies

  • Alessio, Franco, “Un secolo di studi su Ruggero Bacone (1848-1957),” Revista critica de storia della filosofia 14 (1959), 81-102.
  • Little, Arthur G., “Roger Bacon’s Works with reference to The Manuscripts and Printed Editions,” in Little, A.G., Roger Bacon: Essays Contributed by Various Writers on the Occasion of the Commemoration of the Seventh Centenary of His Birth (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1914), 373-426.
  • Hackett, Jeremiah and Maloney, Thomas S., “A Roger Bacon Bibliography (1957-1985),” New Scholasticism 61 (1987), 184-207.
  • Maloney, Thomas S., “A Roger Bacon Bibliography (1985-1995),” in Roger Bacon and the Sciences. Commemorative Essays (Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters, vol. 57), ed. Jeremiah Hackett (Leiden: Brill, 1997), 395-403.
  • Hackett, Jeremiah, “The Published Works of Roger Bacon,” Vivarium 35,2 (1997), 315-320. Contains also an updated list of manuscripts.

b. Primary Sources

Below is a list of Bacon’s major works in chronological order with English translations of the titles. For a complete list of Bacon’s published works, consult Jeremiah Hackett’s bibliography.

i. 1240s–1250s

  • Questiones supra undecimum Prime philosophie Aristotelis (Metaphysica XII), ed Robert Steele (with Ferdinand Marie Delorme), Fasc. 7, 1926, in Opera hactenus inedita Rogeri Baconi, 16 Fascicules, ed. Robert Steele (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1905/1909-1941). [Questions on the Eleventh Book of Aristotle’s First Philosophy] (Cited hereafter by Fasc. Number)
  • Questiones supra libros quatuor Physicorum Aristotelis, ed. Ferdinand Marie Delorme (with Robert Steele), Fasc. 8, 1928. [Questions on the Four Books of Aristotle’s Physics]
  • Questiones supra libros Prime philosophie Aristotelis (Metaphysica I, II, V-X), ed. Robert Steele (with Ferdinand Marie Delorme), Fasc. 10, 1930. [Questions on Aristotle’s First Philosophy]
  • Questiones altere supra libros Prime philosophie Aristotelis (Metaphysica I-IV), ed Robert Steele (with Ferdinand Marie Delorme), Fasc. 11, 1932. [Alternate questions on Aristotle’s First Philosophy]
  • Questiones supra librum De causis, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 12, 1935. [Questions on The Book of Causes]
  • Questiones supra libros octo Physicorum Aristotelis, ed. Ferdinand Marie Delorme (with Robert Steele), Fasc. 13, 1935. [Questions on the Eight Books of Aristotle’s Physics]
  • Liber de sensu et sensato and Summa de Sophismatibus and Distinctionibus, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 14, 1937. [On the Book on Sense and What is Sensed and Summary of Sophisms and Distinctions]
  • Summa Grammatica, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 15, 1940. [Summary of Grammar]
  • Summulae dialectices. I: De termino. II: De enuntiatione. III: De argumentatione, ed. Alain de Libera, in Archives d’Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen-Âge 53 (1986), 139-289 (I-II); 54 (1987), 171-278 (III). [Summary of Dialectics]

ii. 1250s–1268

  • De multiplicatione specierum and De speculis comburentibus, in David C. Lindberg, Roger Bacon’s Philosophy of Nature: A Critical Edition, with English Translation, Introduction and Notes, of De multiplicatione specierum and De speculis comburentibus(Oxford: Clarendon Press 1983). [On the Multiplication of Species and On Burning Mirrors]
  • The ‘Opus maius’ of Roger Bacon, 3 vols., ed. John Henry Bridges (Oxford, 1900). Reprint: Frankfurt: Minerva, 1964. [Major Work]
  • Opus maius, part three: K.M. Fredborg, Lauge Nielsen, and Jan Pinborg (eds.), “An Unedited Part of Roger Bacon’s ‘Opus maiusDe signis,’” Traditio 34 (1978), 75-136. [On Signs, fragment of Opus maius, part three]
  • Opus maius, part five: David C. Lindberg, Roger Bacon and the Origins of Perspectiva in the Middle Ages: A Critical Edition and English Translation of Bacon’s Perspectiva with Introduction and Notes (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996).
  • Opus maius, part seven: Rogeri Baconis Moralis Philosophia, ed. Eugenio Massa (Padua/Zurich: Thesaurus mundi, 1953). [Moral philosophy, critical edition with Latin introduction]
  • Opus minus, ed. John Sherren Brewer, in Fr. Rogeri Bacon Opera quaedam hactenus inedita, ed. John Sherren Brewer (London: Longman, Green, Longman & Roberts, 1859). Reprint: Nendeln/Lichtenstein: Kraus, 1965, 313-389. [Minor Work]
  • Opus tertium, ed. J.S. Brewer, in Fr. Rogeri Bacon Opera quaedam hactenus inedita, ed. J. S. Brewer (London: Longman, Green, Longman & Roberts, 1859). Reprint: Nendeln/Lichtenstein: Kraus, 1965, 3-310. [Third Work]
  • Part of the Opus tertium of Roger Bacon, including a Fragment Now Printed for the First Time, ed. Arthur George Little (Aberdeen: Aberdeen University Press, 1912). Reprint, Farnborough, U.K.: Gregg Press, 1966.
  • Opus maius, Opus minus, Opus tertium (Introduction): Epistola ad Clementem IV papam, in Franics Aidan Gasquet (Cardinal), “An Unpublished Fragment of a Work by Roger Bacon,” English Historical Review 12 (1894), 495-517. [Letter to Pope Clement IV]

iii. 1268–1292

  • Liber primus communium naturalium, parts 1 and 2, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 2, 1905. [First Book on What is Common to Natural Things]
  • Liber primus communium naturalium, parts 3 and 4, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 3, 1911. [First Book on What is Common to Natural Things]
  • Liber secundus communium naturalium (De celestibus), ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 4, 1913. [Second Book on What is Common to Natural Things]
  • Compendium studii philosophiae, in Fr. Rogeri Bacon Opera quaedam hactenus inedita, ed. J. S. Brewer (London: Longman, Green, Longman & Roberts, 1859). Reprint: Nendeln/Lichtenstein: Kraus, 1965, 393-519. [Summary of the Study of Philosophy]
  • Epistola fratris Rogerii Baconis de Secretis Operibus Artis et Naturae, et de Nullitate Magiae, in Fr. Rogeri Bacon Opera quaedam hactenus inedita, ed. J. S. Brewer (London: Longman, Green, Longman & Roberts, 1859). Reprint: Nendeln/Lichtenstein: Kraus, 1965, 523-551. [Letter of Brother Roger on the Secret Works of Art and Nature, and on the Uselessness of Magic]
  • Communia Mathematica, parts 1 and 2, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 16, 1940. [On What is Common to Mathematical Things]
  • Geometria Speculativa, ed. A. George Molland, in Vestigia mathematica. Studies in Medieval and Early Modern Mathematics in Honour of H.L.L. Busard (Amsterdam: Rodopi, 1993), 265-303. (An edition with English translation of the continuation of theCommunia Mathematica not printed in the Steele-edition) [Theoretical Geometry]
  • Secretum secretorum cum Glossis et Notulis, ed. Robert Steele, Fasc. 5, 1920. [The Book of the Secret of Secrets with Glosses and Notes (of Roger Bacon)]
  • De erroribus medicorum, ed. A.G. Little & E. Withington, Fasc. 9, 1928, 150-171.
  • Antidotarius, ed. A.G. Little & E. Withington, Fasc. 9, 1928, 103-119.
  • Grammatica graeca and Grammatica hebraica (The Greek Grammar of Roger Bacon and a Fragment of His Hebrew Grammar), ed. Edmund Nolan and S.A. Hirsch (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1902). (Exact dating of the two grammars not determined)
  • Compendium studii theologiae, Edition and Translation with Introduction and Notes by Thomas S. Maloney (Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters, 20), (Leiden: Brill, 1988). [Summary of the Study of Theology]

c. Secondary Sources

  • Antolic, Pia, “’Experientia est universalis acceptio singularium:’ Die Rezeption der Zweiten Analytiken im Kommentar des Roger Bacon zu Buch I der Metaphysik,” in Knowledge and Science. Problems of Epistemology in Medieval Philosophy, eds. Matthias Lutz-Bachmann, Alexander Fidora, and Pia Antolic (Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 2004), 213-237.
  • Antolic, Pia,  Roger Bacon: ‘Opus maius.’ Eine moralphilosophische Auswahl (Freiburg: Herder, 2008). (German translation of selected passages from Bacon’s Moralis philosophia with introduction)
  • Bérubé, Camille, De la Philosophie à la Sagesse chez Saint Bonaventure et Roger Bacon (Rome: Istituto storico dei Cappuccini, 1976).
  • Crowley, Theodore, Roger Bacon: The Problem of the Soul in his Philosophical Commentaries (Dublin: Frederick Press, 1950).
  • De Libera, Alain, “Roger Bacon et le Probleme de l’Appelatio Univoca,” in in English Logic and Semantics. From the End of the Twelfth Century to the Time of Ockham and Burleigh, eds. H.A.G. Braakhuis, C.H. Kneepkens, L.M. de Rijk (Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers, 1981), 193-234.
  • De Libera, Alain,  “De la logique à la grammaire: Remarques sur la théorie de la determination chez Roger Bacon et Lambert d’Auxerre (Lambert de Lagny),” in De grammatica. A Tribute to Jan Pinborg, eds. G. Bursill-Hall, S. Ebbesen, and K. Koerner (Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing Company, 1990), 209-226.
  • De Libera, Alain,  “Roger Bacon et la reference vide. Sur quelques antecedents médiévaux du paradoxe de Meinong,” in Lectionem varietates: Homages á Paul Vignaux, eds. J. Jolivet, Z. Kaluza, and A. De Libera (Paris: J. Vrin, 1991), 85-120.
  • De Libera, Alain,  “Roger Bacon et la Logique,” in Roger Bacon and the Sciences: Commemorative Essays, ed. Jeremiah Hackett (Leiden: Brill, 1997), 103-132.
  • Del Punta, F., Donati, S., Trifogli, C., “Commentaries on Aristotle’s Physics in Britain, ca. 1250-1270,” in Aristotle in Britain in the Middle Ages, ed. John Marenbon (Turnhout: Brepols, 1996), 265-83.
  • Easton, Stewart C., Roger Bacon and His Search for a Universal Science: A Reconsideration of the Life and Work of Roger Bacon in the Light of His Own Stated Purpose (New York: Columbia University Press, 1952).
  • Fisher, N. W. and Unguru, Sabetei, “Experimental Science and Mathematics in Roger Bacon’s Thought,” Traditio 27 (1971), 353-378.
  • Fredborg, Karin Margareta, “Roger Bacon on ‘Impositio vocis ad significandum,’” in English Logic and Semantics. From the End of the Twelfth Century to the Time of Ockham and Burleigh, eds. H.A.G. Braakhuis, C.H. Kneepkens, L.M. de Rijk (Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers, 1981), 167-191.
  • Hackett, Jeremiah, “Philosophy and Theology in Roger Bacon’s ‘Opus maius,’” in Philosophy and the God of Abraham. Essays in Memory of James A. Weisheipl OP, ed. Raymond James Long (Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 1991), 55-69.
  • Hackett, Jeremiah,  “Roger Bacon,” in Medieval Philosophers, ed. Jeremiah Hackett (Detroit/London: Gale Research Inc., 1992) 90-102.
  • Hackett, Jeremiah,  “Scientia experimentalis: From Grosseteste to Roger Bacon,” in Robert Grosseteste: New Perspectives on his Thought and Scholarship, ed. James McEvoy (Turnhout: Brepols, 1995), 89-120.
  • Hackett, Jeremiah, , ed., Roger Bacon and the Sciences: Commemorative Essays (Leiden: Brill, 1997).
  • Hackett, Jeremiah,  “Roger Bacon: His Life, Career and Works,” in Roger Bacon and the Sciences: Commemorative Essays, ed. Jeremiah Hackett (Leiden: Brill, 1997), 9-23. (1997a)
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Author Information

Pia Antolic-Piper
Email: pia_antolic@hotmail.com
James Madison University
U. S. A.

Émile Durkheim (1858—1917)

DurkheimÉmile Durkheim was a French sociologist who rose to prominence in the late 19th and early 20th centuries. Along with Karl Marx and Max Weber, he is credited as being one of the principal founders of modern sociology. Chief among his claims is that society is a sui generis reality, or a reality unique to itself and irreducible to its composing parts. It is created when individual consciences interact and fuse together to create a synthetic reality that is completely new and greater than the sum of its parts. This reality can only be understood in sociological terms, and cannot be reduced to biological or psychological explanations. The fact that social life has this quality would form the foundation of another of Durkheim’s claims, that human societies could be studied scientifically. For this purpose he developed a new methodology, which focuses on what Durkheim calls “social facts,” or elements of collective life that exist independently of and are able to exert an influence on the individual.

Using this method, Durkheim published influential works on a number of topics. In these works he analyzes different social institutions and the roles they play in society, and as a result his work is often associated with the theoretical framework of structural functionalism. Durkheim is most well known as the author of On the Division of Social Labor, The Rules of Sociological Method, Suicide, and The Elementary Forms of Religious Life. However, Durkheim also published a voluminous number of articles and reviews, and has had several of his lecture courses published posthumously.

When Durkheim began writing, sociology was not recognized as an independent field of study. As part of the campaign to change this he went to great lengths to separate sociology from all other disciplines, especially philosophy. In consequence, while Durkheim’s influence in the social sciences has been extensive, his relationship with philosophy remains ambiguous. Nevertheless, Durkheim maintained that sociology and philosophy are in many ways complementary, going so far as to say that sociology has an advantage over philosophy, since his sociological method provides the means to study philosophical questions empirically, rather than metaphysically or theoretically. As a result, Durkheim often used sociology to approach topics that have traditionally been reserved for philosophical investigation.

For the purposes of this article, Durkheim’s strictly sociological thought will be set aside to allow his contributions to philosophy to take prominence. These fall largely in the realms of the philosophy of religion, social theory, hermeneutics, the philosophy of language, morality, meta-ethics, and epistemology. Durkheim’s deconstruction of the self, as well as his analysis of the crisis brought on by modernity and his projections about the future of Western civilization, also deserve significant consideration.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
    1. Life
    2. Intellectual Development and Influences
    3. Reception of Durkheim’s Thought
  2. The Sociological Method: Society and the Study of Social Facts
    1. Durkheim’s Social Realism
  3. The Sociology of Knowledge: Durkheim and the Logos
    1. Représentations Collectives
    2. Durkheim’s Philosophy of Language
    3. The Categories
    4. The Classification of Knowledge
    5. Cultural Relativism versus Scientific Truth
    6. Conclusion
  4. Durkheim’s Philosophy of Religion
  5. Durkheim on Morality
  6. Social Change and Modernity in the West
    1. Causes of Social Change
    2. The Division of Labor and the Emergence of Modernity in Europe
    3. The Death of the Gods
    4. The New Religion of the West: The Cult of the Individual
  7. The Individual and Society
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Selection of Durkheim’s Works in French
    2. Selection of Durkheim’s Works in English
    3. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

a. Life

David Émile Durkheim was born in April 1858 in Épinal, located in the Lorraine region of France. His family was devoutly Jewish, and his father, grandfather, and great grandfather were all rabbis. Durkheim, however, broke with tradition and went to the École normale supérieure in 1879, where he studied philosophy. He graduated in 1882 and began teaching the subject in France. In 1887 he was appointed to teach Social Sciences and Pedagogy at the University of Bordeaux, allowing him to teach the first ever official sociology courses in France. Also in 1887, Durkheim married Louise Dreyfus, with whom he would eventually have two children. During his time at Bordeaux, Durkheim had great success, publishing his doctoral thesis On the Division of Social Labor (1893, Division), The Rules of Sociological Method (1895, Rules), and Suicide: A Study in Sociology (1897, Suicide). Also, in 1896 he established the prestigious Année sociologique, further cementing sociology’s place in the academic world.

In 1902, Durkheim was finally given a promotion in the form of the chair of the Science of Education at the Sorbonne. In 1906 he became a full professor and in 1913, his position was changed to formally include sociology. Henceforth he was chair of the Science of Education and Sociology. Here he gave lectures on a number of subjects and published a number of important essays as well as his final, and most important, major work The Elementary Forms of Religious Life (1912, Forms). The outbreak of World War I would prove to have disastrous consequences for Durkheim. The war took many of his most promising pupils and in 1915 his son, André, also died in combat. From this Durkheim would never recover and in November 1917 he died of a stroke, leaving his last great work, La Morale (Morality), with only a preliminary introduction.

During his lifetime, Durkheim was politically engaged, yet kept these engagements rather discrete. He defended Alfred Dreyfus during the Dreyfus affair and was a founding member of the Human Rights League. Durkheim was familiar with Karl Marx’s ideas. Yet, Durkheim was very critical of Marx’s work, which he saw as unscientific and dogmatic, as well as of Marxism, which he saw as needlessly conflictual, reactionary, and violent. Nevertheless, he supported a number of socialist reforms, and had a number of important socialist friends, but never committed himself to the party and did not make political issues a primary concern. Despite his muted political engagement, Durkheim was an ardent patriot of France. He hoped to use his sociology as a way to help a French society suffering under the strains of modernity, and during World War I he took up a position writing anti-German propaganda pamphlets, which in part use his sociological theories to help explain the fervent nationalism found in Germany.

b. Intellectual Development and Influences

Durkheim was not the first thinker to attempt to make sociology a science. Auguste Comte, who wished to extend the scientific method to the social sciences, and Herbert Spencer, who developed an evolutionary utilitarian approach that he applied to different areas in the social sciences, made notable attempts and their work had a formative influence on Durkheim. In particular, Durkheim appropriated elements of Comte’s positivism as well as elements of his scientific approach to studying societies. Durkheim’s analysis of the ways in which different parts of society operate to create a functioning whole, as well as his use of the organic analogy, was in many ways inspired by Spencer’s own brand of functionalist analysis. However, Durkheim was critical of these attempts at sociology and felt that neither had sufficiently divorced their analyses from metaphysical assumptions. These were to be found particularly in what Durkheim considered Comte and Spencer’s unilinear models of social development, which were based on a priori laws of social evolution. While Durkheim incorporated elements of evolutionary theory into his own, he did so in a critical way, and was not interested in developing a grand theory of society as much as developing a perspective and a method that could be applied in diverse ways. The sociological method that Durkheim devised, thus, sought to be free of the metaphysical positivism of Comte and Spencer and differed greatly from Comte’s mere extension of the scientific method of the natural sciences to society.

Several of Durkheim’s teachers at the École normale supérieure would also have an important impact on his thinking. With Emile Boutroux, Durkheim read Comte and got the idea that sociology could have its own unique subject matter that was not reducible to any other field of study. Gabriel Monod and Numa Denis Fustel de Coulanges, both historians, introduced Durkheim to systematic empirical and comparative methods that could be applied to history and the social sciences. Charles Renouvier, a neo-Kantian philosopher, also had a large impact on Durkheim. Renouvier was an adamant rationalist and likely played a fundamental role in shaping Durkheim’s interpretation of Kant, specifically Durkheim’s understanding of the categories, an understanding that some observers have called into question. Renouvier was also preoccupied with a number of ideas that would appear in Durkheim’s thinking, including the scientific study of morality or social cohesion and the relation of the individual to society.

Between 1885 and 1886, Durkheim spent an academic year visiting universities in Germany. What Durkheim found there impressed him deeply. He encountered German scholars such as Alfred Wagner, Gustav Schmoller, Rudolph von Jhering, Albert Schäffle, and Wilhelm Wundt who were working on scientific approaches to the study of ethics. Importantly these scholars were relating morality to other social institutions such as economics or the law, and in the process were emphasizing the social nature of morality. Arguably the most important of these thinkers for Durkheim was Wundt, who rejected methodological individualism and argued that morality was a sui generis social phenomenon that could not be reduced to individuals acting in isolation. Taken together, these thinkers laid the foundations for Durkheim’s social realism and provided a powerful critique to utilitarian conceptions of morality, epitomized by Spencer, which viewed the origin of morality within the rational, self-interested calculations of the individual.

Throughout Durkheim’s life, other notable thinkers would have a prominent impact on him. Early in his career Durkheim wrote dissertations about Jean-Jacques Rousseau and Montesquieu, both of whom he cited as precursors to sociology. In 1895 Durkheim’s thinking about society changed dramatically after he read William Robertson Smith’s Lectures on the Religion of the Semites. Before this time, as in Division, Durkheim focused on how the material and morphological elements of a society affected it. After reading Smith’s book, Durkheim began to concentrate on the more ideational elements of society, with an increasing focus on the role of religion in social life. Different philosophers are also prominent in Durkheim’s discussions. The most important of these, arguably, is Kant, whose moral and epistemological theories were of great influence. However Plato, William James, and Descartes, among others, are all present in Durkheim’s work and influenced him in substantial ways.

c. Reception of Durkheim’s Thought

Durkheim remains a fundamental and prominent figure for sociology and social theory in general. Yet, in comparison with Marx and Weber, the influence of Durkheim’s thought has been somewhat muted, especially with regards to philosophy. This can be partly explained by the fact that the Durkheimian school of thought was greatly reduced when many of his most promising students were killed in WWI, that Durkheim went to such great lengths to divorce sociology from philosophy, or by the fact that his thought has been, and continues to be, simplified and misunderstood.

Nevertheless, his ideas had, and continue to have, a strong impact in the social sciences, especially in sociology and anthropology. Members of his research group, such as Marcel Mauss, Paul Fauconnet, Célestin Bouglé, and Lucien Lévy-Bruhl, and later thinkers, such as Maurice Halbwachs, Talcott Parsons, Alfred Radcliffe-Brown, and Claude Levi-Strauss, were all strongly influenced by him. Philosophers such as Henri Bergeson and Emmanuel Levinas acknowledge the influence of Durkheim’s ideas, and his work is also present in that of Jacques Lacan and Maurice Merleau-Ponty. In addition to this, Durkheim’s ideas are latent in the structuralist thought that emerged in post WWII France, for example in Alain Badiou, Louis Althusser, and Michel Foucault. However, these thinkers never discuss Durkheim at length, or acknowledge any intellectual debt to to him. More recently, social theorists such as Pierre Bourdieu, Robert Bellah, and Steven Lukes, and philosophers such as Charles Taylor and Hans Joas, have been influenced by Durkheim’s thinking.

2. The Sociological Method: Society and the Study of Social Facts

According to Durkheim, all elements of society, including morality and religion, are products of history. As they do not have a transcendent origin and are part of the natural world, they can be studied scientifically. In particular, Durkheim viewed his sociology as the science of the genesis and functioning of institutions, with institutions being all of the beliefs and modes of conduct instituted by the collectivity. A fundamental element of this science is the sociological method, which Durkheim created specifically for this purpose.

The foundational claim for Durkheim’s sociology, and what is to make up the subject matter for sociology, is the existence of what Durkheim calls social facts. A social fact, as defined in Rules, is “a category of facts which present very special characteristics: they consist of manners of acting, thinking, and feeling external to the individual, which are invested with a coercive power by virtue of which they exercise control over him.” (Durkheim; 1982: 52) According to Durkheim, social facts have an objective reality that sociologists can study in a way similar to how other scientists, such as physicists, study the physical world. An important corollary to the above definition is that social facts are also internal to individuals, and it is only through individuals that social facts are able to exist. In this sense, externality means interior to individuals other than the individual subject. This leads to the seemingly paradoxical statement that social facts are both external and internal to the individual, a claim that has frequently been misunderstood and left Durkheim’s work open to criticism.

In order to fully grasp how social facts are created and operate, it must be understood that for Durkheim, a society is not merely a group of individuals living in one particular geographical location. Rather, society is an ensemble of ideas, beliefs, and sentiments of all sorts that are realized through individuals; it indicates a reality that is produced when individuals interact with one another, resulting in the fusion of individual consciences. It is a sui generis reality, meaning that it is irreducible to its composing parts and unable to be explained by any means other than those proper to it. In other words, society is greater than the sum of its parts; it supercedes in complexity, depth, and richness, the existence of any one particular individual and is wholly new and different from the parts that make it up. This psychic reality is sometimes (although especially in Division) referred to by Durkheim with the term conscience collective, which can alternately be translated into English as collective conscience or collective consciousness. What is more, society and social phenomena can only be explained in sociological terms, as the fusion of individual consciences that, once created, follows its own laws. It cannot be explained, for example, in biological or psychological terms, or be reduced to the material forms of a society and its immediate vital necessities, as is the case in historical materialism. Social facts are key, since they are what constitute and express the psychic reality that is society. Through them individuals acquire particular traits, such as a language, a monetary system, values, religious beliefs, tendencies for suicide, or technologies, that they would never have had living in total isolation.

In Rules, Durkheim delineates two different classes of social facts. The first class concerns social facts of a physiological, or operative, order. This set of social facts includes a society’s legal code, religious beliefs, concept of beauty, monetary system, ways of dressing, or its language. In these cases it is easy to see how society imposes itself onto the individual from the outside. The first class of social facts also contains currents of opinion, or social phenomena that express themselves through individual cases. Examples include rates of marriage, birth, suicide or migration patterns. In these cases, the operation of society on the individual is not so obvious. Nevertheless, these phenomena can be studied with the use of statistics, which accumulate individual cases into an aggregate and express a certain state of the collective mind. The second class of social facts is of a morphological, or structural, order. It is often concerned with the demographic and material conditions of life and includes the number, nature, and relation of the composing parts of a society, their geographical distribution, the extent and nature of their channels of communication, the shape and style of their buildings, and so forth. While at first glance it might not be evident how the second class of social facts is influenced by collective ways of thinking, acting, or feeling, they indeed have the same characteristics and the same elements of externality and constraint as the first class. In the end, Durkheim dismisses the distinction altogether, claiming that the second class of social facts are simply more crystalized forms of the first class of social facts, making the term ‘social fact’ a very flexible concept that comprises basically any and all social phenomena.

Durkheim then provides a set of rules for studying social facts. The first and most important rule is to treat social facts as things. What Durkheim means by this is that social facts have an existence independent of the knowing subject and that they impose themselves on the observer. Social facts can be recognized by the sign that they resist the action of individual will upon them; as products of the collectivity, changing social facts require laborious effort. The next rule for studying social facts is that the sociologist must clearly delimit and define the group of phenomena being researched. This structures the research and provides the object of study a condition of verifiability. The sociologist must also strive to be as objective towards the facts they are working on as possible and remove any subjective bias or attachment to what they are investigating. Finally, the sociologist must systematically discard any and all preconceptions and closely examine the facts before saying anything about them.

Durkheim applied these rules to empirical evidence he drew primarily from statistics, ethnography, and history. Durkheim treated this data in a rational way, which is to say that he applied the law of causality to it. At this, Durkheim introduced an important rationalist component to his sociological method, namely the idea that by using his rules, which work to eliminate subjective bias, human behavior can be explained through observable cause and effect relationships. Accordingly, he often used a comparative-historical approach, which he saw as the core of the sociological method, to eliminate extraneous causes and find commonalities between different societies and their social facts. In so doing, he strove to find general laws that were universally applicable. Durkheim also argued that contemporary social facts could only be understood in relation to the social facts preceding and causing them. Accordingly, Durkheim followed the historical development of political, educational, religious, economic, and moral institutions, particularly those of Western society, and explicitly made a strict difference between historical analysis and sociology: whereas the historical method strives only to describe what happened in the past, sociology strives to explain the past. In other words, sociology searches for the causes and functions of social facts as they change over time.

In the early part of his career, Durkheim focused on the second class of social facts, or the structural organization of society. Later, social facts of the first class, such as suicide rates, religion, morality, or language became his primary topics of interest. As Durkheim’s interests shifted, his notion of coercion also changed, as did his use of the word ‘constraint’. In his later works, Durkheim focused more on questions of a normative nature, or how individuals come to think and act in similar ways, and less on actual physical or legal constraints. Here society still imposes itself onto the individual, but social facts are seen in a more positive light, as the enablers of human activity or as sources of strength for the individual. As time wore on Durkheim eventually ceased using the word constraint altogether.

a. Durkheim’s Social Realism

An important, and often misunderstood, element of Durkheim’s sociological method is to be found in what can be termed Durkheim’s social realism, or the idea that society is an objectively real entity that exists independently and autonomously of any particular individual, a view that is epitomized by his prescription to treat social facts as things. Within this realist position there are two important claims. First, Durkheim makes an ontological claim concerning the sui generis reality of social facts. Second, Durkheim makes an epistemological and methodological claim, arguing that social facts should be treated as real objects, existing external to the researcher’s mind, that can be determined by their ability to coerce behavior. Hence, Durkheim is arguing that social facts have particular properties of being and that they can be discovered and analyzed when the sociologist treats them in the proper, scientific way.

These elements of Durkheim’s sociology have led to some confusion. Some critics claim that Durkheim is guilty of saying that social facts exist independent and outside of all individuals, which leads them to think that Durkheim hypostatizes some sort of metaphysical “group mind.” Other critics argue that Durkheim is guilty of an ontologism or a realism in which he considers social facts to be material properties of social life.

Durkheim strongly refuted such accusations. In response to the first critique, it must be remembered that social facts are both exterior and interior to individuals, with externality in this case meaning interior to individuals other than the individual subject. To say that social facts exist independent of all individuals is an absurd position that Durkheim does not advocate. Only on a methodological level, in order to study social facts from the outside as they present themselves to individuals, does the sociologist abstract social facts from the individual consciences in which they are present. In response to the second critique, Durkheim maintains that social facts, as manifestations of a psychic, or ideational, reality, do not have a material substratum. They can only be observed through the more or less systematized phenomenal reality (to be analyzed as empirical data) that expresses them. By stating the reality of the ideational realm of social facts in this way, Durkheim’s social realism can be seen as an attempt to bridge diverging schools of philosophical thought, such as realism and nominalism, or empiricism and idealism.

3. The Sociology of Knowledge: Durkheim and the Logos

Durkheim was one of the first thinkers in the Western tradition to examine how an individual’s social milieu affects the way that individual perceives the world. His most definitive statement on the subject can be found in Forms, a book dedicated not only to studying religion, but also to understanding how logical thought arises out of society. Other works, such as Pragmatism and Sociology, a posthumous lecture series given late in his life, elaborate his views. His sociology of knowledge argues that many, if not all, facets of an individual’s thought and conception of the world are influenced by society. Not only are our common beliefs, ideas, and language determined by our social milieu, but even the concepts and categories necessary for logical thought, such as time, space, causality, and number, have their source in society (with the latter claim Durkheim challenges the entire philosophical tradition going back to Aristotle). This logical structure helps to order and interpret the world, ensuring that individuals have a more or less homogenous understanding of the world and how it operates, without which human society would not be possible. And since every society has had some form of logical system to guide its understanding of things, it follows that there has never been a society that is pre-logical or one that has lived in disorder or chaos. To begin to understand Durkheim’s analysis, a fundamental concept of his sociology of knowledge, représentations collectives, needs to be discussed.

a. Représentations Collectives

According to Durkheim, no knowledge of the world is possible without humanity in some way representing it. Furthermore, Durkheim rejects the idea of the Ding an sich, or the transcendent thing in itself. This means that the world exists only as far as it is represented, and that all knowledge of the world necessarily refers back to how it is represented. Accordingly, the central part of Durkheim’s theory of knowledge is his concept of représentations collectives (this term could be translated into English as collective representations, although there is no English equivalent to Durkheim’s use of the French term représentation, which in his work can mean both a copy of something or an idea about something). Représentations collectives are the body of representations a society uses to represent to itself things in reality, as those things relate to and affect society. It is important to note that while représentations collectives refer to things in reality, they are not simple images that reflect reality as it is projected onto the intellect from the outside. Rather they are the result of an interaction between the external world and society; in being represented by society, things are infused with elements of a society’s collective experience, providing those things with a meaning and value. Représentations collectives are thus the repositories and transmitters of collective experience and thereby embody and express the reality of a society’s collective existence. Représentations collectives are of paramount importance to collective life, and it is no surprise that later in his career Durkheim dedicated so much time to their study. While représentations collectives can take on a diverse number of forms, including photographs, fables, myths, and especially religious imagery, Durkheim reserves special analysis to conceptual thought and language, which late in his life Durkheim saw as the primary enabler of all social life.

b. Durkheim’s Philosophy of Language

Durkheim’s analysis of language in many ways illustrates not only what he means by the term représentations collectives, but also how he sees society operating on a fundamental level. As Durkheim explains, words, or concepts, are unlike individual sensory representations, which are in a perpetual flux and unable to provide a stable and consistent form to thought. Concepts are impersonal, stand outside of time and becoming (le devenir), and the thought they engender is fixed and resists change. Consequently, language is also the realm through which the idea of truth is able to come into being, since through language individuals are able to conceive of a world of stable ideas that are common to different intelligences. Thus, language conforms to the two criteria for truth that Durkheim lays out, impersonality and stability. These two criteria are also precisely what allow for inter-subjective communication. Language is, therefore, obviously a sui generis product of social interaction; its necessity only becomes apparent when there are two or more individuals and language can only come into being through the fusion of individual consciences, with the result being completely new and different from and irreducible to the parts that make it up. As such, the concept is common to all, and is the work of the community. Language does not bear the imprint of any mind in particular, and is instead developed by society, that unique intelligence where all of the others come to meet and interact, contributing their ideas and sentiments to the social nexus. This is a claim of great hermeneutical intrigue, since the signification of any word is to be traced back to this potentially endless well of collective experience. Words are merely the way in which society, in its totality, represents to itself objects of experience. As such, language is also infused with the authority of society. With this, Durkheim makes a reference to Plato, saying that when confronted with this system of notions, the individual mind is in the same situation as the nous of Plato before the world of ideas. The individual is thereby compelled to assimilate the concepts and appropriate them as their own, if only so as to be able to communicate with other individuals.

Language, as a set of représentations collectives, also has a unique quality in that it plays an active role in structuring an individual’s perception of reality. As Durkheim argues, objects of experience do not exist independently of the society that perceives and represents them. They exist only through the relationship they have with society, a relationship that can reveal very different aspects about reality depending on the society. This is because contained within language is all of the wisdom and the science that the collectivity has learned over the centuries. Through language society is able to pass on to an individual a body of collective knowledge that is infinitely rich and greatly exceeds the limits individual experience. To think conceptually, thus, does not simply mean to see reality in a general way, it is to project a light onto reality, a light that penetrates, illuminates, and transforms reality. The way in which an individual, literally, sees the world, and the knowledge an individual comes to have about existence, therefore, is highly informed by the language that individual speaks.

c. The Categories

Language is not the only facet of logical thought that society engenders; society also plays a large role in creating the categories of thought, such as time, space, number, causality, personality and so forth. In formulating his theory, Durkheim is especially critical of rationalists, such as Kant, who believe that the categories of human thought are universal, independent of environmental factors, and located within the mind a priori. The categories, such as time and space, are not vague and indeterminate, as Kant suggests. Rather, they have a definite form and specific qualities (such as minutes, weeks, months for time, or north, south, inches, kilometers for space). The characteristics of the categories, furthermore, vary from culture to culture, sometimes greatly, leading Durkheim to believe that they are of a social origin. Durkheim’s rejection of the rationalists, however, does not lead him to the opposing theoretical framework, that of the empiricists. Durkheim is also critical of this school of thought, which argues that an individual’s experience of the world gives rise to the categories. Durkheim argues that the categories share the same properties as concepts. Categories, like concepts, have the qualities of stability and impersonality, both of which are necessary conditions for the mutual understanding of two minds. Like concepts, then, categories have a necessarily social function and are the product of social interaction. Individuals could therefore never create the categories on their own. Durkheim believes that it is possible to overcome the opposition between rationalism and empiricism by accounting for reason without ignoring the world of observable empirical data. In order to do so, Durkheim treats the categories as représentations collectives, and studies them as such.

As Durkheim argues, the categories are the natural, sui generis result of the co-existence and interaction of individuals within a social framework. As représentations collectives created by society, the categories exist independently of the individual and impose themselves onto the individual’s mind, which would have no capacity for categorical thought otherwise. What is more, not only does society institute the categories in this way, but different aspects of the social being serve as the content of the categories. For example, the rhythm of social life serves as the base for the category of time, the spatial arrangement of the group serves as a base for the category of space, the social grouping of society (for example in clans or phratries) serves as a base for the category of class (as in the classification of items), and collective force is at the origin of the concept of an efficacious force, which was essential to the very first formulations of the category of causality. Another category of utmost importance is the category of totality, the notion of everything, which originates from the concept of the social group in total. The categories are not, of course, used only to relate to society. Rather, they extend and apply to the entire universe, helping individuals to explain rationally the world around them. As a result, the ways in which individuals understand the world through the categories can vary in important ways.

This element of Durkheim’s theory has a significant flaw, however. As Steven Lukes has pointed out, Durkheim does not distinguish between the faculties of categorical thinking, such as the faculty of temporality, and the content of these faculties, that is dividing time into set units of measurement. Instead, Durkheim views both the capacity and the content of categorical thought as stamped onto the individual mind by society at the same time. As such, Durkheim’s theory fails to account for the inherent abilities of categorical or logical thought. There may be different classifications within a society, for example, but in order for an individual to recognize these classifications in the first place, they must have prior possession of the ability to recognize classifications. Despite this flaw, an important element of Durkheim’s theory, the idea that the content of the categories is modeled on the organization of society and social life, has proven to be challenging and influential to later thinkers.

d. The Classification of Knowledge

Another vital role that society plays in the construction of human knowledge is the fact that it actively organizes objects of experience into a coherent classificatory system that encompasses the entire universe. With these classificatory systems it becomes possible to attach things one to another and to establish relations between them. This allows us to see things as functions of each other, as if they were following an interior law that was founded in their nature and provides order to an otherwise chaotic world. What is more, Durkheim argues that it was through religion that the very first cosmologies, or classificatory systems of the universe, came into being, in the form of religious myth. Religion was thus the first place where humans could attempt to rationally explain and understand the world around them. As a result, Durkheim argues that the evolution of logic is strongly linked to the evolution of religion (though both ultimately depend upon social conditions). This leads to the claim that religion is at the origin of much, if not all, of human knowledge. This argument has a far reach, affecting even the way in which modern science views itself. Following Durkheim, while modern science might claim to have no kinship with religion and in fact claim to be opposed to religion, it is in effect through religion that the conceptual and logical thought necessary for scientific thinking originated and was first elaborated. This component of Durkheim’s sociology of knowledge has been highly provocative and influential both in sociology and beyond.

e. Cultural Relativism versus Scientific Truth

With such a theory of knowledge, Durkheim reveals himself to be a cultural relativist, arguing that each culture has a network of self-referential logic and concepts that creates truths that are legitimate and, while not necessarily grounded in the reality of the physical world, are grounded within the reality of their respective social framework. Truths of this nature Durkheim calls mythological truths. In opposition to this relativistic view of truth, however, Durkheim also defends scientific rationalism and the idea that there exist scientific truths that are not dependent on cultural context and that express reality “as it is.” These scientific truths, or scientific représentations, are subjected to stringent verification and methodological control, and while they express these truths through inadequate symbols and in an approximated way, they are more perfect and more reliable than other représentations collectives. Despite the fact that they are of a fundamentally different nature (expressing reality as it is and not the reality of society), scientific représentations operate in the same way and are just as instrumental to society as other représentations collectives. Scientific truths deal with the same subject matter as mythological truths (nature, man, society), and like other représentations collectives they serve to reinforce and unify the collective conscience around one idea. Scientific truths are also représentations to which society has added the knowledge it has accumulated historically through collaborative effort. Scientific représentations reflect collective experience and express the relationship a society has with the world around it. Thus, while, there are objective truths about the world to be discovered, it would be mistaken to think that reality exists independently, or is logically antecedent, of it being represented through society, since it is only through collective effort that these scientific truths are discovered, and thus come to being. Scientific truths, while of a special nature, are also in an important way bound by the limits of society.

f. Conclusion

In the end, Durkheim strives to account for a total sociology of knowledge. Society creates for itself, through its représentations collectives, a vast network of language and logical thought that is instrumental in allowing its individuals to understand and think the world. And, since the world exists only as far as it is thought, and since the world is totally thought only by society, the world takes its shape in society. In other words, society establishes, from the outset, the limits of possibility for rationality, linguistic expression, and knowledge in general.

4. Durkheim’s Philosophy of Religion

During Durkheim’s life, his thinking about religion changed in important ways. Early in his life, as in Division, he argued that human societies could exist on a secular basis without religion. But later in his life he saw religion as a more and more fundamental element of social life. By the time he wrote Forms, Durkheim saw religion as a part of the human condition, and while the content of religion might be different from society to society over time, religion will, in some form or another, always be a part of social life. Durkheim also argues that religion is the most fundamental social institution, with almost all other social institutions, at some point in human history, being born from it. For these reasons he gave special analysis to this phenomenon, providing a philosophy of religion that is perhaps as provocative as it is rich with insights.

According to Durkheim, religion is the product of human activity, not divine intervention. He thus treats religion as a sui generis social fact and analyzes it sociologically. Durkheim elaborates his theory of religion at length in his most important work, Forms. In this book Durkheim, uses the ethnographic data that was available at the time to focus his analysis on the most primitive religion that, at the time, was known, the totemic religion of Australian aborigines. This was done for methodological purposes, since Durkheim wished to study the simplest form of religion possible, in which the essential elements of religious life would be easier to ascertain. In a certain sense, then, Durkheim is investigating the old question, albeit in a new way, of the origin of religion. It is important to note, however, that Durkheim is not searching for an absolute origin, or the radical instant where religion first came into being. Such an investigation would be impossible and prone to speculation. In this metaphysical sense of origin, religion, like every social institution, begins nowhere. Rather, as Durkheim says, he is investigating the social forces and causes that are always already present in a social milieu and that lead to the emergence of religious life and thought at different points in time, under different conditions.

Durkheim’s analysis is not without its detractors, who criticize among other things his methodology, his misinterpretation of ethnographic data, or his undermining of traditional religion. Nevertheless, his assertion that religion has an essentially social foundation, as well as other elements of his theory, have been reaffirmed and re-appropriated over the years by a number of different thinkers.

It is important to look at the starting point of Durkheim’s analysis, his definition of religion: “A religion is a unified system of beliefs and practices relative to sacred things, that is to say, things set apart and forbidden--beliefs and practices which unite in one single moral community called a Church, all those who adhere to them.” (Durkheim; 1995: 44) There are, thus, three fundamental elements to every religion: sacred objects, a set of beliefs and practices, and the existence of a moral community. Of the three, perhaps the most important would be the notion of the sacred, which is the point around which any religious system revolves. It is that which inspires great respect and admiration on the part of society and what is set apart and keeps us at a distance. Durkheim contrasts the sacred with the notion of profane, or that which desecrates the sacred and from which the sacred must be protected, making the opposition between sacred and profane a central element of Durkheim’s theory. With this definition Durkheim also puts an emphasis on the social element of religion. This is important because he spends a great deal of time in Forms arguing against theorists like Herbert Spencer, Edward Tylor, or James Frazer who locate the origin of religion in psychological phenomena such as dreams (the animistic view of Spencer) or natural phenomena, such as storms (the naturalistic view of the latter two). Durkheim argued that such an interpretation of phenomena was socially learned, and could only be the effect of an already established religion, not its cause. With this said, it is now time to examine how Durkheim believes a religion originates and operates.

According to Durkheim, a religion comes into being and is legitimated through moments of what he calls “collective effervescence.” Collective effervescence refers to moments in societal life when the group of individuals that makes up a society comes together in order to perform a religious ritual. During these moments, the group comes together and communicates in the same thought and participates in the same action, which serves to unify a group of individuals. When individuals come into close contact with one another and when they are assembled in such a fashion, a certain “electricity” is created and released, leading participants to a high degree of collective emotional excitement or delirium. This impersonal, extra-individual force, which is a core element of religion, transports the individuals into a new, ideal realm, lifts them up outside of themselves, and makes them feel as if they are in contact with an extraordinary energy.

The next step in the genesis of religion is the projecting of this collective energy onto an external symbol. As Durkheim argues, society can only become conscious of these forces circulating in the social world by representing them somehow. The power of religion must therefore be objectified, or somehow made visible, and the object onto which this force is projected becomes sacred. This sacred object receives the collective force and is thereby infused with the power of the community. It is in this way that a society gains a tangible idea, or representation, of itself. When discussing these matters, Durkheim is careful to use the word “sacred object” to describe what is traditionally understood in the West as a god. This is because sacred objects can be very diverse and do not necessarily refer to supernatural deities. For example, God is the sacred object for Christian societies, Thor was the sacred object for Viking society, but the four noble truths are also sacred objects for Buddhists, and, as we will see, the individual person has become the sacred object for modern, Western society. Physical objects, such as rocks, feathers, totem polls, crosses, and so forth, can also become infused with the force of the collectivity, thereby becoming sacred and serving as a physical reminder of society’s presence. Such views on religion allow Durkheim to make the radical claim that a society’s sacred object is nothing but the collective forces of the group hypostatized. Religion is society worshipping itself, and through religion, individuals represent to themselves society and their relationship to it.

With this, Durkheim lays bare the inner workings of a society’s symbolic network. With Durkheim’s rejection of the thing in itself, the meaning and value of an object are not intrinsic to it, but are to be found in that object’s relationship to society. Said otherwise, an object’s status is determined by the meaning that society attributes to it, or as its status as a représentation collective. Importantly, this analysis goes beyond what is strictly considered the religious realm, since all socially derived meaning operates in the same way. For example, a stamp, a flag, or the sport of football are by themselves just a piece of paper, a piece of cloth, or a group of padded men chasing a leather ball; they are all essentially worthless and derive their value from the reality of collective forces they represent and embody. The more important a society determines an object to be, the more valuable it will be in the eyes of an individual.

If these moments of collective effervescence are the origin of religious feelings, religious rituals must be repeated in order to reaffirm the collective unity of a society, otherwise its existence is at risk. Durkheim remarks that if the societal forces central to the religious life of a society are not re-animated, they will be forgotten, leaving individuals with no knowledge of the ties that exist between them and no concept of the society to which they belong. This is why religious ritual is necessary for the continued existence of a society; religion cannot exist through belief alone-it periodically needs the reality of the force behind the belief to be regenerated. This takes place through various religious rituals, in which collective beliefs are reaffirmed and the individual expresses their solidarity with the sacred object of society, or with society itself. The form the specific ritual takes can vary greatly, from funerals to rain dances to patriotic national holidays, but its goal is always the same. Through these rituals, society maintains its existence and integrates individuals into the social fold, exerting pressure on them to act and think alike.

Of great significance to Durkheim’s theory is his insistence on the reality of these religious phenomena. As he argues, the social forces that animate a society’s religious life are real, and are really felt by the participants. While it is a mistake for an individual to believe that this power emanates directly from the sacred object, or is somehow intrinsic to the sacred object, behind the symbol manifesting the force is a living and concrete reality. Consequently, all religions are true, at least symbolically, for they express a power that does exist, the power of society. Religion, religious belief, and the religious experience cannot, therefore, be dismissed as mere fantasies or illusions.

5. Durkheim on Morality

Durkheim’s moral philosophy was unfortunately denied its culmination by his untimely death in 1917. His writings on the subject, therefore, lack the consistency he would have liked to give them. Nevertheless, he did publish several important articles, most notably his Determination of a Moral Fact (1906), and gave lectures on the subject, including the posthumously published Moral Education, from which his views on morality can be deciphered.

Durkheim’s moral theory is unique in that he rejects theorists who rely on a priori moral concepts or abstract logical reasoning to construct ethical systems. Rather, Durkheim treats moral phenomena as conditioned both socially and historically. Each society creates over time its own set of moral rules, which can vary dramatically from one society to the next, with each society creating for itself moral principles that are more or less adequate to its existential needs. When analyzing moral phenomena, the moral philosopher must take into consideration the socio-historical context of the moral system they are operating in and make moral prescriptions accordingly, or risk doing great harm to that society. However, that there exists no universal morality for humanity in no way abnegates the validity of any moral system and does not open the door to moral nihilism. On the contrary, moral rules are rooted in the sui generis reality of society that the individual cannot deny; morality is a social fact and should be studied as such. This approach to morality would form the basis of what Durkheim considers a physique des moeurs, or a physics of morality, a new, empirical, rational science of morality. Yet, what exactly does Durkheim understand morality to be? And how does it operate in a society?

While Durkheim’s understanding of morality can at times be vague and lead to several interpretations, he most often understands morality as a system of rules and maxims that prescribes to individuals’ ways of behaving in different situations. Contained within this moral system is a set of moral values, beliefs, and ideas that provide a framework for the rules. Morality is also a wholly social phenomenon, with morality not existing outside of the limits of society. As Durkheim claims, morality begins only when an individual pertains to a group.

Moral rules have several unique characteristics that separate them from other rules that might be found in society. These special features lie in morality’s obligatory nature and in its desirability. According to Durkheim, at the heart of morality is a central moral authority that commands to its adherents its moral precepts. Through this central authority the individual feels an external constraint to conform to a society’s moral code. Obligation is thus a fundamental element of morality. This aspect of morality corresponds closely to the Kantian notion of duty, whose influence Durkheim openly acknowledges. However, Durkheim was critical of the Kantian notion of duty, since he felt that the repressive notion of duty was lacking a positive counterweight. For Durkheim, such a counterweight is found in the desirability of morality, which is equally important and necessary for the existence of morality. What Durkheim means with the desirability of morality is that the individual views the authority dictating to them their obligations as a higher power that is worthy of their respect and devotion. When an individual performs their duty, they feel as if they are working towards some sort of higher end, which Durkheim equates to the good (le bien). As a result, the individual willingly accepts the obligatory nature of moral rules and views them beneficially.

Within this dual obligatory-desirability element of morality, Durkheim views to a large extent the influence of religion. According to Durkheim morality and religion are intimately linked, and goes so far as to say that the moral life and the religion of a society are intimately intertwined. Wherever one finds a religion, one will find with it an accompanying moral doctrine and moral ideals that are commanded to believers. Moral authority is, thus, born out of religious life and draws its authority from the power of religion, which, as seen in the section above, is merely society’s collective force hypostatized and made visible. Religious imagery therefore takes on a moral tone and can be an important physical source of moral authority in a society. It is not surprising to Durkheim then that religious imagery inspires the same emotions of fear, obedience, and respect that an individual feels in the face of moral imperatives. In this way, moral authority is constituted by a force that is greater than the individual, outside of the individual, but also a force that penetrates the individual and shapes their personality.

At this, Durkheim was keen to distinguish two elements of morality, both equally important to moral behavior. On the one hand, there is the morality of the group, which exists objectively and outside of the individual. On the other hand there is the individual’s way of representing this morality. Indeed, there are moral rules created by society that exert a pressure on the individual, but each individual expresses the morality of their society in their own way. It is impossible for any individual to exactly translate the moral conscience of society, which means that even where moral conformity is the most complete, the individual still retains an individual moral conscience and has a hand in adding elements of their personality to society’s moral codes. This allows the individual to create, at least in part, their own morality. In this way, morality has both an extra-individual element and an individual element, as is the case with all other social facts.

Yet, one is inclined to ask, is the individual free to critique moral rules? Can morality not be changed? Is there any space for individual autonomy in this matter? According to Durkheim, moral rules do not need to be blindly followed by individuals. If the individual finds reason to object, critique, or rebel against the moral principles of society, not only is this possible, but it is perhaps even beneficial to society. For example, it is possible that changes take place within a society that can either cause a moral principle to be forgotten, or produce a schism between a traditional moral system and new moral sentiments that have not yet been recognized by the collective conscience. When this happens, an individual is correct to show the relevance of the forgotten moral principle or to illuminate what these new moral sentiments are exactly (as an example of the latter case Durkheim points to Socrates). For these purposes, the physique des moeurs can be very helpful. Thus, an individual is able to experiment with different moral claims, but only granted that these moral claims reflect that actual moral state, or states, of society (the individual is of course free to completely reject society, but this would only confirm the existence of the moral rules being rejected and potentially cause harm to the individual). This last caveat demonstrates that even when the individual acts in an autonomous way, they are, morally speaking, still bound by the limits of society.

6. Social Change and Modernity in the West

One of the most prominent and problematic interpretations of Durkheim’s thought is the misconception that he does not have a theory of social change. On the contrary, social change is a primary focus in much of Durkheim’s thought. In particular, Durkheim focuses on Europe’s difficult transition from a medieval society to a modern one. Thus, Durkheim’s structural analyses of social institutions are complemented in important ways by analyses of the dynamic nature of these phenomena.

a. Causes of Social Change

Durkheim’s theory of social change is largely elaborated in Division. In this book Durkheim argues that social change is a mechanical process, meaning that it is not directed in any intentional way. It is spurred above all by changes in the ways that people interact with each other, which in turn depend upon the demographic and material conditions of a society. The two main factors affecting social interaction are increases in population density and advances in technology, most notably in the fields of communication and transportation. This is because population growth and technology advances increase social connectivity, leading to interactions that differ in quantity, intimacy, frequency, type, and content. Cities, the locus of social change, also emerge and grow as a result of changes in population and technology. The rate at which individuals come into contact and interact with one another is what Durkheim calls moral or dynamic density.

The most important change to take place as a result of increased moral density occurs on a structural level and is what Durkheim calls the division of labor. At their beginning, societies are characterized by what Durkheim calls mechanical solidarity. In mechanical solidarity, groups are small, individuals in the group resemble each other, and their individual conscience is more or less synonymous with and dependent on the collective conscience. There is little to no individual volition and individuals belong to the group. The individual and individuality as we understand them do not exist. As the moral density increases, this changes. Appealing to Darwin’s evolutionary theory that the more alike two organisms are the greater the combat for the resources will be, Durkheim argues that with an increase in moral density comes greater competition for fewer resources. In order to mitigate the competition and make social life harmonious, individuals in a society will specialize their tasks and pursue different means to make a living. The more a society grows in moral density, the more the labor of a society will divide and the more specialized the tasks of its individuals will become. This leads to what Durkheim calls organic solidarity, or solidarity based not upon individual resemblances, but upon the functional interdependence of society’s individual parts, much the way the organs of a body are interdependent. In this way, Durkheim argues, modern societies will retain their cohesion. Concerning the specific impacts of the division of labor, Durkheim concentrates his analysis on Europe.

b. The Division of Labor and the Emergence of Modernity in Europe

One of the most important effects of the division of labor is the rise of individualism and the importance of the individual within a society. In order for the specialization of tasks to take place, the individual must be given more freedom to develop their work. As the specialization increases, the autonomy of the individual will also increase, since the rest of society will be less and less capable of telling the individual how to do the work. In this way, the individual feels in a real way less acted upon by society. As a result of these divisions in society, there will also be fewer and fewer collective experiences shared by all members of the group, leading further to different points of view and a greater diversity among individuals and within the collective conscience. The division of labor thus has the important effect of individuating the population and creating differences between individuals in a society. The creation of the individual through this process is perhaps the defining characteristic of modernity.

It is worth noting here Durkheim’s opposition to social contract theorists and utilitarians, like Spencer, who argue that society begins when individuals come together to form groups. In many ways his book Division is a refutation of this theory and strives to show that collective life is not born from the individual, but, rather, that the individual is born out of collective life.

The division of labor also had major impacts within the economic and social realms, as evidenced by the historical development of Europe. In medieval society, there were well-defined social institutions in the realms of religion, politics, and education that were each distinct from one another. The organization of the economic sector was especially important, with guilds developing into strong, independent institutions that were at the heart of social life. These institutions regulated prices and production and maintained good relations between members of the same craft. These institutions and structures of society ensured that individuals were integrated into the social fold properly, promoting social solidarity. In the 18th and 19th centuries, however, a large growth in population was coupled with a large demographic shift, which was aided by technological innovation (such as the railroad, the steamship, and various manufacturing techniques). Without the previous restrictions on mobility or production capabilities, cities grew greatly in size, production of goods centralized, and the economic and social equilibrium that existed in the medieval period was ruptured. The ever-greater mobility of goods and people extended the reach of economic, political, and social institutions. As a result the guild system disappeared and regional trading interdependence gave way to international interdependence. Large-scale institutions in politics, education, medicine, shipping, manufacturing, arts, banking and so forth that were free from regional limitations developed and extended their influence to greater portions of society.

In essence, Durkheim is describing the birth of the modern industrial state. The concentration of the population and the centralization of the means of production created an enormous shift in the way of life for large parts of European society. It also changed the way that people related to one another. City life was characterized by fewer and weaker intimate relationships, greater anonymity, but also greater personal freedoms. Factory life was also different from the guild system, as workers were separated from their family for greater parts of the day, there was greater stress on workers’ nervous systems, and workers worked on assembly lines that regimented and mechanized their movements. Under these circumstances, the way of life that corresponded to medieval society no longer corresponded to the way of life in the modern industrial world. It was impossible for new generations to live in the same ways as their predecessors and European society witnessed a weakening of all its previous traditions, particularly its religious traditions.

c. The Death of the Gods

“The old gods are aging or are already dead, and others are not yet born.” [Durkheim; 2005 (1912): 610-611]

An incredibly important but often overlooked part of Durkheim’s philosophy is his declaration of the death of the gods of European society, and what this means for the future of Western civilization. Durkheim’s declaration, however, should not be confused with Friedrich Nietzsche’s famous “death of God.” While Durkheim was familiar with some of Nietzsche’s work and favorable points of comparison between the two could be made on the subject, Durkheim does not appear to have been influenced by Nietzsche in this respect. Rather, Durkheim’s declaration of the death of the gods is closely linked to his analysis of the social disintegration of European society brought about by modernity, a subject that he comes back to throughout the entirety of his career, from Division to Forms. Yet how is one to understand this statement? What does this mean for European society?

There are two parts to Durkheim’s declaration that need to be de-compacted. On the one hand the old gods are dead. Because of the massive transformations taking place, European society became profoundly de-structured. The institutions animating medieval life disappeared. As a result, individuals were having a hard time finding meaningful attachments to social groups and society as a whole lost its former unity and cohesiveness. Not only this, but the transformations that led to modernity also rendered former beliefs and practices irrelevant. The big things of the past, the political, economic, social, and especially religious institutions, no longer inspired the enthusiasm they once did. With former ways of life no longer relevant and society no longer cohesive, the collective force so vital for the life of a society was no longer generated. This would have an important impact on the religion of medieval society, Christianity. Because society no longer had the means to create the collective force that exists behind God, belief in God weakened substantially. Christian society was no longer sufficiently present to the individual for faith in God to be maintained; the individual no longer felt, literally, the presence of God in their lives. With the lack of faith in God also came a rejection of other elements of Christian doctrine, such as Christian morality and Christian metaphysics, which were beginning to be replaced respectively by modern notions of justice and modern science. In sum, the social milieu that supported Christianity disappeared, leaving Christian faith, values, and thinking without any social foundations to give them life.

That Christianity faded away in European society is not a problem in itself, for it merely reflects a natural course of development a society may take. The problem arises when taking into consideration the second element to Durkheim’s phrase: no new gods have been created to replace the old ones. For Durkheim, the changes in European society were taking place too quickly and no new institutions had been able to form in the absence of the old ones. European society had not yet been able to create a religion to replace Christianity. Instead what Durkheim saw in Europe was a society in a state of disaggregation characterized by a lack of cohesion, unity, and solidarity. Individuals in such a society have no bonds between them and interact in a way similar to molecules of water, without any central force that is able to organize them and give them shape. European society had become nothing but a pile of sand that the slightest wind would succeed at dispersing. In other words, European society was no longer a society in Durkheim’s sense of the word, and as such was open to a number of further problems.

To begin, such a society is incapable of generating social forces that act on the individual. It is unable to create an authority that exerts pressure on individuals to act and think in a similar manner. Without these forces acting on the individual from the outside, individuals are dispersed from their commitment to society and left to their own. Duties are no longer accepted carte blanche and moral rules no longer seem binding. As such, individuals increasingly are detached from group obligation and act out of self-interest. These are the two conditions that Durkheim believes characterize the moral situation of modern European society: rampant individualism and weak morality. Durkheim’s term for this “froid moral” in which morality breaks down is anomie, a state of deregulation, in which the traditional rules have lost their authority.

A second problem stemming from the fact that society is no longer present to individuals is a higher suicide rate, specifically with two types of suicide that Durkheim identifies in Suicide. The first is egoistic suicide, in which an individual no longer see a purpose to life and sees life as meaningless. These feelings arise because the bonds integrating the individual to society have weakened or been broken. This problem involves society because society is an important source of meaning and direction for individuals, giving them goals to pursue and norms to guide them. The second type of suicide is anomic suicide, which involves what Durkheim calls a “mal d’infini.” Normally society, with the help of its moral code, plays an important part in defining what are legitimate aspirations in life, as concerns wealth, material goods, or any other type of pleasure. Without limits set on these desires, the passions are unregulated, and the individual’s expectations do not correspond with reality. Consequently the individual is perpetually unhappy. Both types of suicide result from a weakness of social solidarity and an inability for society to adequately integrate its individuals.

A final consequence is that society has no central measure for truth and no authoritative way of organizing or understanding the world. In such a state, there arises the potential for conflict between individuals or groups who have different ways of understanding the world. Such a conflict could be seen in the 19th and early 20th centuries between Christian religious doctrine and modern science, a conflict that Durkheim’s own sociology took part in and one that continues today.

Essentially, Durkheim’s analysis of the death of the gods concentrates on the underlying disorganization of European society that led to the demise not only of Christianity, but of a number of other economic, political, and social institutions as well. This same underlying disorganization was preventing European society from generating the collective force necessary for the creation of new institutions and a new sacred object. The death of the gods is a symptom of a sickened society, one that has lost its internal structure and descended into an-archy, or a society with no authority and no definitive principles, moral or otherwise, to build itself on. In spite of such a glum analysis, Durkheim did have hope for the future. Out of the chaos he saw the emergence of a new religion that would guide the West, what he termed “the cult of the individual.”

d. The New Religion of the West: The Cult of the Individual

According to the later Durkheim religion is part of the human condition and as long as humans are grouped in collective life, they will inevitably form a religion of some sort. Europe could thus be characterized as in a state of transition; out of the ashes of Christianity, a new religion would eventually emerge. This new religion would form around the sacred object of the human person as it is represented in the individual, the only element common to all in a society that is becoming more and more diverse and individualized. Appropriately, Durkheim calls this new religion the ‘cult of the individual.’ But how does this religion begin? What is its conception of individual? And what kind of society/religion does the cult of the individual create?

To begin, the cult of the individual begins, like all religions according to Durkheim, with collective effervescence. The first moments of collective effervescence for the cult of the individual could be found in the democratic revolutions taking place in Europe and elsewhere at the end of the 18th and during the 19th centuries. The French Revolution is the perfect example of such a release of collective energy. The concept of individual that these social movements were embracing follows strongly the line of thinking that was established during the Enlightenment; it is based on a general idea of human dignity and does not lead to a narcissistic, egotistical worship of the self. As Durkheim argues, the individualism of the cult of the individual is that of Kant and Rousseau; it is what the Déclaration des droits de l’homme (Declaration of the Rights of Man), the document produced by revolutionaries during the French Revolution, attempted to codify more or less successfully. In other words, the cult of the individual presupposes an autonomous individual endowed with rationality, born both free and equal to all other individuals in these respects. Belief in this abstract conception of individual creates the ideal around which the cult revolves.

With this sacred object at its core, the cult of the individual also contains moral ideals to pursue. These moral ideals that define society include the ideals of equality, freedom, and justice. The specific moral code that translates these ideals is built around the inalienable rights of the individual; any disenfranchisement of an individual’s human rights or any violation of an individual’s human dignity is considered sacrilege and is a moral offence of the highest order. Furthermore, with society becoming more diverse, the respect, tolerance, and promotion of differences become important social virtues. Private property, as a tangible expression of an individual’s autonomy and rights, likewise becomes a symbol of the sacred character of the individual and is itself imbued with a certain degree of sacredness. Considering its ideals and beliefs, the cult of the individual also has a political dimension. Modern democracy, which encodes, institutionalizes, and protects the rights of the individual, is the form of government whereby Western societies best express their collective belief in the dignity of the individual. It is by protecting the rights of the individual in this way, somewhat paradoxically, that society is best preserved.

Rationality is also of primary importance to this religion. The cult of the individual has as a first dogma the autonomy of reason and as a first right free inquiry. Authority can and must be rationally grounded in order for the critically rational individual to have respect for social institutions. In continuing with the importance of rationality, modern science provides the cosmology for the cult of the individual. Scientific truths have come to be accepted by society as a whole and Durkheim even says that modern society has faith in science in the same way that past societies had faith in Christianity cosmology; despite that most individuals do not participate in or fully understand the scientific experiments taking place, the general population trusts scientific findings and accepts them as true. Modern science has an advantage, however, in that, unlike other religious cosmologies, it avoids dogmatizing about reality and permits individuals to challenge scientific theories through rational inquiry, fitting with the doctrine of the cult of the individual perfectly.

However, with the large growth in population and the individualization of society, it becomes very easy for society to lose hold of individuals or for the government to become out of touch with the population it serves. If there was to be social integration and solidarity, there needed to be ways in which the moral capacities of individuals could be ensured, and through which individuals could feel attachment to society. As a way of preventing the creation of a wholly individualistic society, Durkheim advocates the existence of intermediary groups, in particular labor unions. These groups would have a double purpose. On the one hand they would be intimate enough to provide sufficient social bonds for the individual, which would serve to integrate the individual into the society and develop their moral conscience. On the other hand, they would represent the demands of individuals to the government and thereby ensure that the state does not become domineering.

Through the new religion of the cult of the individual, to which he gave his full support, Durkheim predicted that European society would once again find the unity and cohesion it was lacking; once again it would have a sacred object. The extent to which Durkheim’s predictions have come true can be debated, although several developments since Durkheim’s death point to the validity of his thought. For example, the Universal Declaration of Human Rights was passed in 1948, more than 30 years after Durkheim’s death. This document could be regarded as the central holy text of the cult of the individual and today international moral discourse is dominated by questions of human rights. Furthermore, as some scholars have pointed out, the growth of democratic movements around the world, particularly since the fall of the Soviet Union, could also be used as evidence of the merits of Durkheim’s theories. In any case, Durkheim acknowledges that this religion, like all others preceding it, would only be of use to humanity temporarily, and would eventually be replaced by some future system of belief more adequate to the needs of society.

7. The Individual and Society

Durkheim is one of the first thinkers in the Western tradition, along with other 19th century thinkers such as Friedrich Nietzsche, Charles Peirce, and Karl Marx, to reject the Cartesian model of the self, which stipulates a transcendental, purely rational ego existing wholly independent of outside influence. In opposition to the Cartesian model, Durkheim views the self as integrated in a web of social, and thus historical, relations that greatly influence their actions, interpretations of the world, and even their abilities for logical thought. What is more, social forces can be assimilated by the individual to the point where they operate on an automatic, instinctual level, in which the individual is unaware of the effect society has on their tastes, moral inclinations, or even their perception of reality. Social forces thus comprise an unconscious “substructure” of the mind, in which they have to varying degrees been incorporated by the individual. In consequence, if an individual wants to know themselves, they must understand the society of which they are a part, and how this society has a direct impact on their existence. In fact, in a complete reversal of Descartes, Durkheim, following the sociological method, advocates that in order to understand one’s self, the individual must avoid introspection and look outside of themselves, at the social forces that determine their personality. In these ways, Durkheim anticipated by at least fifty years the post-modern deconstruction of the self as a socio-historically determined entity.

Partly because of this conception of the individual, and partly because of his methodology and theoretical stances, Durkheim has been routinely criticized on several points. Critics argue that he is a deterministic thinker and that his view of society is so constraining towards the individual that it erases any possibility for individual autonomy and freedom. Others argue that his sociology is too holistic and that it leaves no place for the individual or for subjective interpretations of social phenomena. Critics have gone so far as to accuse Durkheim of being anti-individual due in part to his consistent claims that the individual is derived from society.

Such critics, however, misconstrue a number of elements of Durkheim’s thought. To begin, there is an important individual component to society in that it is both external and internal to individuals. Durkheim makes clear on several occasions that elements of society, such as religious beliefs, morality, or language, are incorporated and appropriated by individuals in their own manner. While it is true that représentations collectives, for example, are the work of the collectivity and express collective thought through the individual, when the individual assimilates them they are refracted and colored by the individual’s personal experiences, thereby differentiating them. Thus, each individual expresses society in their own way. It should also be remembered that social facts are the result of a fusion of individual consciences. As such there is a delicate interplay between the individual and society whereby the individual not only maintains their individuality, but is also able to enrich the field of social forces by contributing to it their own personal thoughts and feelings.

In another sense, critics claiming that Durkheim is anti-individual overlook his analysis of modern society. As discussed above, according to Durkheim’s theory of the division of labor, as societies develop, they cultivate differences between individuals by necessity. This grants individuals an increasing amount of freedom to develop their personality. At least in Western society, the development of and respect for individualism has grown to such an extent that it has become the object of a cult; the individual is a sacred object and the protection of individual liberties and human dignity has been codified into moral principles. Granted that this individualism is itself a product of collective life, modern society, if anything, encourages individual autonomy, diversity, and freedom of thought as shared social norms.

As a whole, there is no antagonism between the individual and society in Durkheim’s sociology. In fact, Durkheim argues that to adhere to a group is the only thing that makes an individual human, since everything that we attribute as being special to humanity (language, the ability for rational thought, the ability for moral action, and so forth) is a product of social life. Far from being anti-individual, Durkheim never lost sight of the individual, and the relation of the individual to society is a guiding question throughout his work. Rather than showing that individuals are wholly subservient to society for all aspects of their existence, Durkheim’s analyses demonstrate that in order to understand the individual, it is necessary to situate them within the network of social relations that informs and influences their life. This is exactly what Durkheim’s sociology does, and its strength lies precisely in its illumination and deconstruction of those elements of society that have the greatest bearing on and realize themselves through the individual.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Selection of Durkheim’s Works in French

  • “La Science positive de la morale en Allemagne.” Revue philosophique 24: 33-58, 113-42, 275-84, 1887.
    • Review of ideas of German moralists Wagner, Schmoller, Schaeffle, Ihering, Wundt, and Post.
  • De la division du travail social: étude sur l'organisation des sociétés supérieures. Paris: Alcan, 1893.
  • Les Règles de la méthode sociologique. Paris: Alcan, 1895.
  • Le Suicide, Paris: Alcan, 1897.
  • “L'Individualism et les intellectuels.” Revue bleue, 4e série 10: 7-13, 1898.
    • In many ways, Durkheim’s most definitive statement on the cult of the individual.
  • Les formes élémentaires de la vie religieuse. 5ème edition, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2005 (1912).
  • “Le Dualisme de la nature humaine et ses conditions sociales.” Scientia 15: 206-21, 1914.
    • An article examining Durkheim’s thoughts on the social/religious origin of the mind-body split and its implications for human civilization.
  • L'Allemagne au-dessus de tout: la mentalité allemande et la guerre. Paris: Colin, 1915.
    • Pamphlet examining German nationalism during WWI.
  • Sociologie et philosophie. Préface de Célestin Bouglé. Paris: Alcan, 1924.
    • Contains three important articles: “Représentations individuelles et représentations collectives” (1898), “La Détermination du fait moral” (1906), and “Jugements de valeur et jugements de réalité” (1911).
  • L'Éducation morale. Présentation de Paul Fauconnet. Paris: Alcan, 1925.
    • A lecture course Durkheim regularly gave on the subject of morality and how it could be instilled in individuals through various disciplinary mechanisms.
  • Le Socialisme. éd. avec introduction de M. Mauss, Paris: Alcan, 1928.
    • A text examining the history of socialist ideas and the socialist movement, including Karl Marx and St. Simon.
  • Leçons de sociologie: physique des moeurs et du droit. Istanbul: L'Université d'Istanbul. “Publications de l'Université Faculté de Droit,” no. 3; et Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1950.
  • Pragmatisme et sociologie. Paris: Vrin, 1955.
    • A lecture course given by Durkheim examining and critiquing Pragmatist views on truth and defending his sociological explanation of truth.

b. Selection of Durkheim’s Works in English

  • The Division of Labor in Society. Translated by W.D. Halls. New York: The Free Press, 1984.
  • The Rules of Sociological Method and Selected Texts on Sociology and Its Method. Translated by W. D. Halls, Steven Lukes, ed. New York: The Free Press, 1982.
  • Suicide: A Study in Sociology. Translated by John A. Spaulding and George Simpson. Glencoe, Illinois: The Free Press of Glencoe, 1951.
  • The Elementary Forms of the Religious Life. Translated by Karen Fields. New York: Free Press, 1995.
  • “Germany Above All”: German Mentality and the War. Paris: Colin, 1915.
    • Pamphlet examining German nationalism during WWI.
  • Sociology and Philosophy. Translated by D. F. Pocock. London: Cohen and West, 1953.
    • Contains three important articles: “Individual and Collective Representations” (1898), “The Determination of Moral Facts” (1906), and “Value Judgments and Judgments of Reality” (1911).
  • Professional Ethics and Civic Morals. Translated by Cornelia Brookfield. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1957.
  • Socialism and Saint-Simon. Translated by C. Sattler. Yellow Springs, Ohio: Antioch Press, 1958.
    • A text examining the history of socialist ideas and the socialist movement, including Karl Marx and St. Simon.
  • “The Dualism of Human Nature and Its Social Conditions.” in Émile Durkheim, 1858-1917: A Collection of Essays, with Translations and a Bibliography, edited by Kurt Wolff. Translated by Charles Blend. Columbus, Ohio: Ohio State University Press, 1960.
    • An article examining Durkheim’s thoughts on the social/religious origin of the mind-body split and its implications for human civilization.
  • Moral Education: A Study in the Theory and Application of the Sociology of Education. Translated by Everett K. Wilson and Herman Schnurer. New York: Free Press of Glencoe, 1961.
    • A lecture course Durkheim regularly gave on the subject of morality and how it could be instilled in individuals through various disciplinary mechanisms.
  • “Individualism and the Intellectuals.” Political Studies 17: 14-30, 1969.
    • In many ways, Durkheim’s most definitive statement on the cult of the individual.
  • Pragmatism and Sociology. Translated by J.C. Whitehouse. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
    • A lecture course given by Durkheim examining and critiquing Pragmatist views on truth and defending his sociological explanation of truth.

c. Secondary Sources

  • Allen, N.J., W.S.F. Pickering, and W. Watts Miller eds. On Durkheim’s Elementary Forms of Religion Life. London: Routledge, 1998.
    • Collection of essays on Durkheim’s most important work on religion and logical thought.
  • Aron, Raymond. Les étapes de la pensée sociologique. Paris: Gallimard, 1976.
    • A critical look at the founders of sociological thought, including Montesquieu, Comte, Marx, Tocqueville, Durkheim, Pareto and Weber.
  • Bellah, Robert. “Introduction.” in Emile Durkheim on Morality and Society. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1973.
    • Excellent introduction to Durkheim’s thought with a collection of important texts.
  • Besnard, Phillippe. ed. The Sociological Domain: The Durkheimians and the Founding of French Sociology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
    • A collection of essays that examines the foundation of the Durkheimian school of sociology in France at the beginning of the 20th century.
  • Bourdieu, Pierre and Jean-Claude Passeron. “Sociologie et philosophie en France depuis 1945: mort et resurrection de la philosophie sans sujet.” trans. “Sociology and Philosophy in France since 1945: Death and Resurrection of a Philosophy without Subject,” in Social Research, vol. 34, no. 1, 1967, p. 162-212.
    • A long essay examining the reception, or rather the rejection and ignorance, of Durkheim’s oeuvre in the post WWII period in France.
  • Cladis, Mark. A Communitarian Defense of Liberalism: Emile Durkheim and Contemporary Social Theory. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1992.
    • Reappraisal of Durkheim social and political thought in a contemporary context.
  • Cladis, Mark, ed. Durkheim and Foucault: Perspectives on Education and Punishment. Oxford: Durkheim Press, 1999.
    • A collection of essays examining the similarities and differences between Durkheim and Foucault concerning education, disciplinary techniques, and the individual subject in the modern age.
  • Fournier, Marcel. Emile Durkheim 1858-1917. Paris: Fayard, 2007.
    • The definitive French language study of Durkheim’s life and work.
  • Godlove, Terry, ed. Teaching Durkheim. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005.
    • A collection of essays that explores different ways of teaching Durkheim’s philosophy of religion.
  • Jones, Robert Allen. Emile Durkheim: An introduction to four major works. Beverly Hills CA: Sage Publications, 1986.
    • An introduction to Durkheim’s four most important works.
  • Jones, Robert Allen. The Development of Durkheim’s Social Realism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
    • An exploration of the early influences of Durkheim’s that which led to his social realism.
  • Karsenti, Bruno. La société en personnes. Études durkheimiennes, Economica, 2006.
    • Examines the legacy of Durkheim’s sociology for both philosophy and sociology. Guide to understanding Durkheim’s thought.
  • Lehmann, Jennifer. Deconstructing Durkheim: A Post-Post Structuralist Critique. New York: Routledge, 1993.
    • A reappraisal of Durkheim’s work from a philosophical perspective.
  • Lukes, Steven. Émile Durkheim: His life and works. Middlesex: Penguin Books, 1973.
    • The definitive English language study of Durkheim’s life and work.
  • Meštrovic, Stjepan. The Coming Fin de Siècle: An Application of Durkheim's Sociology to Modernity and Postmodernism. London, Routledge, 1992.
    • An interesting application of Durkheim’s theories to contemporary society.
  • Miller, W. Watts. Durkheim, Morals, and Modernity. London: Routledge, 1996.
    • Examination of Durkheim’s moral theory and its application to modern society.
  • Nielsen, Donald. Three Faces of God: Society, Religion, and the Categories of Totality in the Philosophy of Emile Durkheim. Albany: SUNY Press, 1998.
    • Examination of Durkheim’s sociology in a philosophical context, comparing it to Spinoza, Kant, Aristotle, Bacon, and Renouvier.
  • Pickering, William S. F. Durkheim’s Sociology of Religion. London: Routledge, 1984.
    • In-depth study of Durkheim’s theory of religion.
  • Pickering, William S. F. Durkheim and Representations. London: Routledge, 2000.
    • On Durkheim’s theory of knowledge and representation and its relationship to Kant and Renouvier.
  • Tiryakian, Edward. Sociologism and Existentialism. Englewood Cliffs NJ: Prentice Hall, 1962.
    • Original and ground-breaking comparison between Durkheim’s sociology and the thought of existential thinkers such as Kierkegaard, Sartre, Nietzsche, Heidegger, Jaspers, and more. The main point of comparison between the two schools of thought is the relationship of the individual to society.
  • Tiryakian, Edward. For Durkheim (Rethinking Classical Sociology). Farnham, England: Ashgate, 2009.
    • Collection of essays by Edward Tiryakian indicating the relevance of Durkheim’s thought to today’s modern world.
  • Turner, Stephen. The Search for a Methodology of Social Science: Durkheim, Weber, and the Nineteenth-Century Problem of Cause, Probability, and Action. Dordrecht, the Netherlands: Reidel, 1986.
    • An in-depth look at the inspirations and particulars of Durkheim’s methodology and Weber’s theory of action.
  • Turner, Stephen, ed. Emile Durkheim: Sociologist and Moralist. New York: Rutledge, 1993.
    • A collection of essays from top Durkheim scholars examining different elements of his social theory in connection with his moral theory.
  • Schmaus, Warren. Durkheim's Philosophy of Science and the Sociology of Knowledge: Creating an Intellectual Niche. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1994.
    • A look at Durkheim’s sociology of knowledge.
  • Schmaus, Warren. Rethinking Durkheim and his Tradition. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
    • An important reassessment of the work of Emile Durkheim within the context of the 19th century French philosophical tradition, looking specifically at the French tradition’s misreading of Kant’s categories and its influence on Durkheim.
  • Stedman-Jones, Susan. Durkheim Reconsidered. Cambridge: Polity Press, 2001.
    • Important volume that re-examines Durkheim’s status in the philosophical world and clears up a number of misconceptions about his thought.
  • Thompson, Kenneth. Emile Durkheim. London: Routledge, 1982.
    • Excellent introduction to Durkheim’s work.
  • Valade, Bernard. ed. Durkheim. L’Institution de la Sociologie. Paris, Presses Universitaires de France, 2008.
    • Collection of essays discussing and re-examining the project and institution of Durkheim’s sociology.


Author Information

Paul Carls
Email: paul.carls@umontreal.ca
University of Montreal