Jeanne-Françoise Frémyot, Baronne de Chantal (1572—1641)

photo of de ChantalCanonized a Catholic saint in 1767, Jeanne de Chantal (Jane of Chantal) has rarely been the object of philosophical analysis.  Until recently, her influence has largely confined itself to the Visitation order she founded and to the network of schools sponsored by the Visitation nuns.  Contemporary theologians, however, have studied her works from the perspective of spirituality. Her extensive writings provide an elaborate map of the soul's journey toward perfection; they also indicate the charismatic authority of women in the ministry of spiritual direction and moral counsel during the era.  De Chantal’s lectures, conferences, and letters merit philosophical attention inasmuch as they constitute an early modern chapter in moral psychology.  Their ascetical concept of moral virtue and their mystical account of the soul reflect a theory of human nature embedded in the convent culture of the Counter-Reformation in France.  Destined for a convent audience, her commentaries on the writings of Saint Augustine constitute a gendered Augustinianism adapted to the needs of an exclusively female public.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Theological Philosophy
    1. Virtue Theory
    2. Nature and Will
    3. Divine Attributes
    4. Augustinianism
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born on January 23, 1572 in Dijon, Jeanne-Françoise Frémyot belonged to a prominent Burgundian family of lawyers.  Her father, Bénigne Frémyot, was the president of the Parliament of Burgundy and a leader of the royalist party.  Her mother, Marguerite de Berbisey, a descendant of the family of St. Bernard of Clairvaux, died when Jeanne-Françoise was only eighteen months old.  Her widowed father then married Claire Jousset, who is believed to have died shortly after the marriage.

Educated at home, Jeanne-Françoise studied reading, writing, music, and dancing.  She excelled in embroidery; throughout her life she would be renowned for her needlework.  Her father personally supervised her study of history, morals, and religion.

On December 29, 1592, Jeanne-Françoise married Christophe II de Rabutin, baron de Chantal.  Residing at his ancestral castle of Bourbilly, Madame de Chantal soon revealed her skill as an administrator by reforming the economics and work habits of the dilapidated estate.  She also gained a saintly reputation for her work among the sick and the poor, especially during the region’s times of famine.  She bore six children, three of whom survived into adulthood: Celse-Bégnine (1596-1633), Marie-Aimée (1598-1617), and Françoise (1599-1684).  Her husband died as the result of a hunting accident in 1601.  During her prolonged period of mourning, Madame de Chantal made a private vow to God that she would remain celibate during the remainder of her life and that, once her children were sufficiently old, she would devote herself to works of charity.

In 1604, De Chantal’s spiritual life reached a turning point.  She met François de Sales, the bishop of Geneva who was living in exile in Annecy, due to Calvinist opposition. He delivered a series of Lenten sermons in Dijon.  Agreeing to serve as her spiritual director, De Sales introduced the widow to his own spirituality, most notably expressed in his Introduction to the Devout Life.  He also introduced her to his more philosophical works.  Drawing from Thomas Aquinas and Teresa of Avila, his Treatise on the Love of God provided an extensive Augustinian presentation of God’s attributes, the nature of the soul, and the virtues essential for the ascetical and mystical life.  In their correspondence De Sales shared with De Chantal extracts from the treatise in progress.

In 1610, believing that she was free to leave her adolescent children in the care of others, De Chantal left her home to join François de Sales in Annecy.  Her eldest child, Celeste-Bégnine, the future father of Madame de Sévigné, would long resent what he considered an unjustified abandonment.  In the same year, she founded a new female religious order, the Visitation of Holy Mary, with De Sales.  The new order was to differ from current religious orders in several details.  The nuns were not to be cloistered.  They would make simple rather than solemn vows.  They would wear the simple clothes of the poor rather than religious habits.  They would regularly leave the convent to minister to the poor, the sick, and the elderly in their homes.  The order’s rule of life would be comparatively gentle, proper for candidates for the convent who might be elderly or suffer from physical disabilities.  The order quickly grew from its original foundation in Annecy, but it underwent a crisis in 1615 when the Archbishop of Lyons insisted that the order adopt a constitution, which would impose strict cloister on the nuns.  De Chantal and De Sales protested since such restriction would destroy the announced apostolate of the order.  However, in 1618, with Pope Urban VIII supporting the demand for cloister, the co-founders acquiesced.  By the time of De Sales’s death in 1622, the order had thirteen houses. By the time of De Chantal’s death, it would count eighty-six.

From her headquarters in Annecy, De Chantal directed the order as its superior general.  Besides frequent visitations to the order’s daughter houses, she maintained an extensive correspondence with her fellow nuns, benefactors, and laypeople seeking spiritual direction.  Copied in manuscript form, her frequent lectures and conferences at Annecy were widely circulated among Visitation convents and other religious communities.  During her lifetime she acquired a reputation for sanctity, although she often confided in her more intimate writings that she suffered from spiritual aridity and desolation during the decade preceding her death.

Her letters and addresses indicate the philosophical and theological culture she had developed, especially under the tutelage of De Sales.  The works of De Sales constitute the most cited theological and philosophical sources.  Among patristic authors, she often quotes St. Augustine and St. Jerome.  She has a pronounced interest in the ascetical and mystical writers of the Spanish Counter-Reformation: Teresa of Ávila, Alphonsus Rodríguez, and Álvarez de Paz.  Her virtue theory is clearly influenced by these authors.  Other women authors cited by De Chantal include Catherine of Siena and Madame Acarie, the founder of the reformed French Carmelites.

Madame de Chantal died on December 13, 1641.  The Catholic Church beatified her in 1751 and canonized her a saint in 1767.

2. Works

The works of Jeanne de Chantal are exclusively religious in focus.  Several hundred letters from her extensive correspondence have survived.  She also wrote a long memorandum for the canonization process of François de Sales, Deposition for the Process of Beatification of St François de Sales and Responses Concerning Rules, Constitutions, and Customs, in which the superior general offered her interpretation of disputed points concerning the Visitation order’s charism and regulations.  Many of the works of De Chantal were originally oral in nature.  Visitation nuns transcribed her many addresses to nuns. These addresses included exhortations on spiritual topics such as the Rule of Saint Augustine, liturgical feasts, and occasional topics. More informal conferences, in which De Chantal answered questions posed by the nuns in assembly were also transcribed, as well as instructions given to novices at the very beginning of their convent life.  The written transcriptions of these addresses should be treated with caution, since De Chantal’s actual words are often altered by the taste and perspective of the particular amanuensis.  These addresses are of special philosophical interest because in these works De Chantal gives her most detailed theory of the virtues, of the nature of the soul, and of the divine attributes.  The Visitation nuns circulated manuscript copies of these writings among the Visitation convents.  Many of the original manuscripts remain in the archives at the Visitation motherhouse in Annecy.

During the lifetime of De Chantal, print versions of her works were already circulating.  De Chantal objected to some of these publications since she wanted to confine most of her writings to circulation within the order.  Shortly after her death, hagiographic biographies of the foundress circulated alongside the print versions of her writings.  The 1751 beatification and 1767 canonization stimulated new interested in writings by and about De Chantal.

In the nineteenth century, the Visitation nuns at Annecy published the collected works of Madame de Chantal in Ste Jeanne Françoise Frémyot de Chantal, Sa vie et ses oeuvres (1874-1879.)  The Visitation scholar Patricia Burns has recently published a critical edition of De Chantal’s letters in Jeanne-Françoise Frémyot de Chantal, Correspondance (1986-1996).  The Visitation nuns have also been largely responsible for the English translation of the works of De Chantal.  The Visitation convent of Harrow published Selected Letters of Saint Jane Frances de Chantal (1918). The Visitation convent of Bristol provided the translation for Saint Jane Frances Frémyot de Chantal, Exhortations, Conferences and Instructions (1929).  The Visitation scholar Péronne Marie Thibert translated De Chantal’s letters for Francis de Sales and Jane de Chantal, Letters of Spiritual Direction (1988).

3. Theological Philosophy

The philosophical arguments of De Chantal are embedded in a specific theological project: the guidance of nuns and laywomen toward perfection in Christ in the communion of the Catholic Church.  The virtues defended by De Chantal are distinctively Christian with a strong monastic coloration.  The analysis of the will emerges in the context of exhortations concerning the will’s perilous ascent toward union with God. Other faculties of the soul are studied through their relationship to the practice of prayer.  The moral theory and philosophical psychology of De Chantal are situated in a context which has the convent as its primary audience and pedagogical concern.

a. Virtue Theory

In De Chantal’s works the standard moral virtues receive comparatively little attention.  The discussions of temperance, fortitude, and justice are spare and indirect.  De Chantal instead emphasizes virtues with a clear theological, indeed monastic, color: charity, humility, abnegation, and abandonment to the divine will.  The moral habits prized by De Chantal reflect the distinctive culture of the convent, of the Visitation order with its stress on ascetical moderation, and of the Counter-Reformation with its mystical narrative of the soul in gradual ascent toward ecstatic union with God.

Humility constitutes the cornerstone of the edifice of virtue.  More than simple meekness, humility entails a recognition of one’s utter dependence upon God for existence and salvation.  “Humility of heart is nothing else than the genuine knowledge that we are nothing and that we can do nothing.  It is desiring with a true desire that others should hold and treat us as such.  What is called humility of heart makes us always annihilate ourselves in everything, without exception, and makes us consider ourselves always better treated and esteemed than we deserve” [Conference no. 40].  The emphasis on the annihilation of self as a psychological sign of true humility is typical of the era’s école française of spirituality, with its characteristic emphasis on annihilation (anéantissement) of personal desire as one of the signs of true union with God.

Humility enjoys a certain primacy among the virtues because it alone can perfect the internal life of the soul.  Once humility has been acquired, the moral agent’s other internal dispositions and even external actions will find their proper place.  “We do not apply ourselves to the true and solid interior virtues.  We apply ourselves too much to the exterior.  I do not mean to say that we should not practice and esteem the latter, but the interior ones are more precious to us.  We owe our chief concern and fidelity to the acquisition of these, because they are more in conformity with our vocation and because the inward virtues bring about the exterior ones…..If our spirit were very humble and brought low, all our actions, all our words, and all our exterior would also be this way” [Exhortation no. 3.6].  Without the foundation of humility, the ensemble of a moral agent’s other virtues and the expression of these virtues through external acts would suffer an inevitable distortion.

While central to the moral life, the virtue of humility is acquired only with great difficulty.  This difficulty springs from the disordered attachments that routinely enslave the moral subject.  “There are three things we rid ourselves of only with difficulty.  The first is honor, love, and self-esteem.  The second is love of our bodies and their comforts.  The third is the hatred we have for inward and outward submission … True humility tends to the contempt of this self-esteem and makes us love to be considered poor, ignorant, little, and imperfect, and to be forgotten by all creatures” [Conference no. 17] .  The triumph of humility in the soul destroys attachments to corporeal goods, social acclaim, and willfulness, which prevent the soul from attaining authentic happiness.

The social expression of this humility in the life of the nun entails a certain egalitarianism.  In dealing with either social superiors or peers, the humble nun exhibits a frank honesty that excludes flattery or condescension.  “If we were sent to the parlor to speak with princes or princesses, we should not need to think about what we should say to them nor try to compose a speech.  We should just tell them simply and without artifice what Our Lord might say to us, keeping ourselves humbly and faithful attentive to Him.  Similarly, we should be very simple, cordial, and unpretentious in dealing with our sisters.  We should respect and love them dearly, whether they be our superiors, equals, or inferiors.  We should prefer them all to ourselves and prefer ourselves to no one” [Exhortation no. 4.17].  Based upon a refusal of one’s claim to social superiority, humility levels social distinctions among the laity and among the members of religious orders.

The model and source of this humility is Christological.  It is Jesus himself who constitutes the perfect mirror of the humility the nun must cultivate.  “How did that gentle Lord not abase Himself in honor? ... He reduced Himself to such an extremity on that point that He suffered like any other mortal creature … From all powerful He appears all powerless; from all great, all little; from all terrible, all gentle and kind, allowing Himself to be guided like a tiny lamb; from all rich with the eternal riches of the Father of light, of Whom He is by nature the Eternal Son, He is become all poor among mortals, born in an obscure stable, and has only what He barely needs” [Exhortation no. 4.3].  The paradoxes of the Incarnation, especially the self-emptying of Christ as he takes flesh, illustrate humility in its purest possible form.  Christ not only provides the model for humility, through grace, he infuses and strengthens the virtue within the pious moral subject.

Allied to humility is the virtue of simplicity.  In the life of the nun, the vow of poverty permits her to give tangible external expression to the internal disposition of simplicity.  Conventual simplicity involves both physical and spiritual renunciation.  “Poverty of spirit is a detachment from all created things, if we possess them.  This poverty of spirit requires us not to set our affections on them, so that we must be poor in affection and will concerning these things and have our heart detached and completely free … Another kind of poverty is to leave them for the love of God in order to serve Him more perfectly.  We must leave them in affection and not only in fact.  True and perfect poverty of spirit is to have nothing but God in our mind” [Conference no. 28].  The simplicity and poverty defended here have a contemplative end inasmuch as they free the moral subject to focus her attention on God alone.

In De Chantal’s writings, obedience ranks as one of the essential virtues, especially for the nun who has pronounced a vow of obedience to her superior.  De Chantal’s high esteem for obedience is rooted in her hierarchical vision of the cosmos, of the political order, and of the church.  “God, by His supreme wisdom, has arranged has arranged the order of the universe in the following way: He has made all creatures submissive and dependent on each other.  The whole universal Church obeys the Sovereign Pontiff as the Vicar of our Lord Jesus Christ; each part of this Divine Spouse has a head, a bishop, whom it obeys.  Moreover, all the religious orders have superior on which each subject depends.  All private families have a father to direct and govern the family.  I am not speaking here about political obedience and subjection.  That would concern kings, princes, governors, and how soldiers obey their captains and how the entire body of an army obeys its general―they often show such an exact obedience that they shame us before God― I am only speaking to you now to make you understand that we are appointed to obey.  We must do so in an exact following of the will of God, Who is the only end of the submission of our wills” [Conference no. 5.14].  In De Chantal’s perspective, the entire universe represents an elaborate hierarchy of command and submission ordained by God.  The political and religious orders of human society imitate and participate in this hierarchy.  The virtue of obedience involves the decision of the moral agent to respect these various hierarchies through the inclination of one’s personal will. In its purest form, that of the religious vow of obedience, obedience is the surrender of one’s will to the direction of one’s legitimate superior.

The virtue of obedience in religious life presupposes one’s obedience to the moral law, as interpreted by the church.  The nub of the virtue of obedience in cloistered life is one’s complete indifference at the hands of one’s superior.  This obedience reflects a personal spiritual freedom.  “We should be ready to accomplish obedience, as many times as it shall be pleased to send us to any place and under any pretext, without any excuse.  Some say they would prefer not to be sent to small towns under the apparently good pretext that they would have less spiritual help there or that they would be more exposed to danger in times of war or other similar excuses.  If these people would examine themselves carefully and see themselves as they really are, they will find that their position is nothing but the fruit of pride, a pride so covered by these apparently good pretexts that they are blinded and do not even know the truth about themselves” [Exhortation no. 3.4].  The reasons given to refuse commands of religious obedience are only rationalizations born out of the moral subject’s desire for comfort and fear of suffering.  Authentic obedience joins docility with indifference in the presence of a morally valid command from one’s superior.

Throughout her works, De Chantal stresses charity as the highest theological virtue.  If humility is the foundation of the moral life, charity constitutes its summit.  As with the other virtues, the monastic practice of charity possesses a note of detachment.  “Thanks to God’s goodness, I have no particular like or dislike for any of my sisters.  I love those who are good because God dwells them; I love those who are not so good because God wills that I should practice the holy virtue of charity.  Those who do best give me the most consolation; those who do not do will afflict my heart.  Still, my soul and my mind love all of them and I will spend and be spent in aiding, serving, and helping them” [Exhortation no. 4.13].  The affective indifference toward the different nuns as well as the fundamental virtue of charity is presented as the fruit of divine grace.

De Chantal not only privileges the theological virtues in her account of moral virtue, she often transforms ordinary moral virtues by redefining them in a monastic context.  Her treatment of patience is typical.  Patience emerges as a virtue central for the endurance of the seasons of spiritual aridity, which are inevitable in a serious life of contemplative prayer.  “We must live in the present moment, without forecast and without worry about ourselves, concerning either the future or the present.  We should do things just as they present themselves to us.  We should profit by everything in good faith and without any other concern than that of pleasing God, by the means supplied by our vocation alone and without searching for some external resources” [Conference no. 35].  An ascetical virtue, patience permits the contemplative to focus on one’s present duties and not be distracted by memories of a past where God’s consolations were more palpable or in a desired future where God’s graces would be more tangible.

Not all moral virtues are capable of such a theological transformation.  According to De Chantal, even some of the cardinal virtues oppose the proper moral formation of the Christian and nun.  Prudence, for example, often allies itself with self-love and thus prevents the exercise of charity.  “Self-love leads to the loss of everything in the spiritual life, because it brings forth its own seeking, which hinders us from seeking God and His good pleasure.  Human prudence also does much harm; as long as we nourish this false prudence, this human spirit will act in us … It will be difficult to overcome these two enemies, for they are dexterous and deal their blows with such subtlety that very often we are not aware of them until they have done their part” [Exhortation no. 3.3].  Rather than crowning the philosophical ensemble of natural moral virtues, the constellation of theological virtues defended by De Chantal provides an alternative set of moral habits to be cultivated by the human subject in the quest of a happiness tied to salvation.

Another obstacle to the cultivation of authentic virtue is the empire of passions upon the human soul.  De Chantal rejects the theory that some ascetical exercise or mystical experience could permanently extinguish the passions. Those who claim to live in such an emotion-free state are suffering from a serious spiritual illusion.  When the passions break out in the soul, the virtuous Christian must learn how to carefully negotiate a gradual calming of the emotions.  Violent efforts to oppose one’s passions will only result in failure.  “Here is a little model of what we are to do when, rowing peacefully in our little boat, we feel, without thinking about it,  all our passions arise and cause a great storm in us, as if they would overwhelm us and drag us after them.  We must not wish to calm this tempest ourselves, but we must gently draw near the shore, keeping our will firmly in God, and coast along the small waves, to reach, through humble self-knowledge, God, who is our sure port.  Let us go along gently, without effort and without yielding to our passions anything they wish.  By so doing, we will arrive later in that divine port with more glory than if we had enjoyed a perfect calm and had steered our boat without any difficulty” [Conference no. 6].  The passions constitute an essential part of human nature; any effort to deny their power rests on an illusion concerning the affective dimension of the human subject.  Providentially, God’s tolerance of the many unexpected eruptions of passion permits the virtuous Christian to recognize one’s finitude and to acknowledge the limits of the power of one’s will.

b. Nature and Will

De Chantal’s philosophy of human nature focuses primarily upon the faculty of the will.  Distorted by original sin and concupiscence, human nature must undergo a reformation if it is to achieve its proper fulfillment in union with God.  It is in abandonment to divine providence that the human will, often disfigured by self-love, finds its proper happiness.

Conventual life is a paradigm of how sinful nature must be transformed into a nature redeemed by grace.  This overcoming of self-loving human nature constitutes the purpose of the vowed life in community.  “We have not come within these walls to live according to nature; we are taught from the commencement that we must overcome it.  We must then do this with generosity and, instead of following self-love and the human spirit, live by a holy strength of the mind, according to the lights of grace and reason.  These two lights, properly followed, are enough for leading the soul to the highest perfection of divine love” [Exhortation no. 3.3].  Properly sanctified, human nature emerges at the end of a spiritual itinerary of conversion, not at its origin.  The insistence on the complementarity of reason and grace reflects the characteristic moderation of De Chantal’s theological positions.

The requisite conversion of nature requires a certain violence to oneself.  Vices can be eradicated and virtues cultivated only at the price of this internal spiritual combat.  “I tell you often that heaven suffers violence and that the conquerors and the strong carry it way.  He who will go on to perfection must renounce himself and carry his cross.  All these are words uttered by the Eternal Truth … We have love of God to the degree we mortify ourselves and earnestly subject our nature … We shall never truly please God except by destroying our nature.  We shall never enjoy interior peace unless we practice mortification and the entire renunciation of our interior inclinations” [Exhortation no. 4.14].  This ascetical anthropology conceives human nature as a nature to be morally purified and strengthened both by grace and by ascetical measures.  Rather than being a metaphysical given, human nature is to be resisted, transformed, and molded in an itinerary of strenuous personal reformation.

One of the prerequisites for this ascetical transformation is authentic self-knowledge.  Allied to the virtue of humility, accurate self-knowledge acknowledges one’s moral misery in the state of sin.  “We must really know ourselves, our nothingness, our meanness, and our vileness.  If our understanding is filled with this truth, we shall see clearly that there are many defects, imperfections, and many things to reform in us.  In truth, we are full of wretchedness and poverty” [Conference no. 1].  The self-knowledge prized here is the frank recognition of one’s morally depraved state.

The acquisition of such self-knowledge is difficult.  All too often human efforts at introspection are biased by self-love; it is only through divine grace that the human subject can make a realistic appraisal of his or her morally perilous state.  “There is a vast difference between looking at ourselves in God’s sight and looking at ourselves in our own.  If we look at ourselves in God’s sight, we shall see ourselves as we really are, but if we look at ourselves in our own sight, we shall see ourselves as self-love suggests.  This love of ourselves does us great harm.  Unless we mortify it and  overthrow its favorite pursuits and interests, its vanity and good opinion of oneself, we shall not advance on our way and we shall always remain dwarfs in virtue” [Exhortation no. 4.2].

At the center of this spiritual struggle lies the human faculty of the will.  The will’s intentions largely determine whether a particular soul will overcome its sinfulness and truly adhere to God through a process of purification.  In a virtuous soul, the desire to do God’s will should be the only motive in one’s conduct, regardless of emotional or economic circumstances.  “Solid virtue consists in attaching ourselves only to God, in wishing for God alone, in seeking God alone, and in depending on God alone, in serving him constantly and with perseverance in whatever state He places us, whether we be in prosperity or adversity, in consolation or affliction, in health or in sickness, in dryness or in sweetness.  The failing to take pleasure in the good actions we do takes away neither the power of doing them nor the merit of them.  On the contrary, they are more agreeable to God when there is less of us in them, because we are acting more purely for Him” [Conference no. 26].  It is in the subservience of the human will to the divine will that authentic union of the soul with God emerges.

The summit of this voluntaristic union with God lies in the act of spiritual abandonment.  The human agent abandons his or her will into the divine will. The moral life becomes the effort to permit the divine will to direct one’s actions as purely as possible.  “It is a true point that we find  the highest and most sublime perfection when we are entirely given over to, dependent upon, and submissive to the events of Divine Providence.  If we have indeed surrendered to this providence … it would be indifferent to us to be humbled or exalted, to be led by this hand or the other, to be in dryness, aridity, sorrow, and privation, or to be comforted by the divine unction and by the sensible enjoyment of God.  In fact, we should keep ourselves in the good hands of the great God like cloth in the hands of the tailor, who cuts it in a hundred ways for use as he pleases” [Conference no. 41]. The passage reflects the Salesian emphasis on abandonment to divine providence as the keystone of spiritual maturity and of psychological peace.  The climax of human will is in its durable immersion in the divine will.  This voluntaristic anthropology places the itinerary of the will at the center of the moral and spiritual journey of the human subject.

c. Divine Attributes

Practical in orientation, the writings of De Chantal rarely engage in speculative theology.  Several works, however, focus on the attributes of God.  De Chantal attempts to link the contemplation of the divine attributes to motivation for confidence in God in this life and to hope of possessing God in the next.

In seeking solid reasons for hoping in God’s providence, De Chantal underlines three divine attributes: omnipotence, perfect goodness, and perfect wisdom.  “You wish to know the foundations upon which we are to support our confidence in God.  Here you have three points: first, because He is all wise; second, because He is all good; third, because He is all powerful.  Consequently, He knows everything we need for our soul and body.  He is all good and goodness itself; He shows this by what He has done for us.  He is all powerful because He gives us what He sees to be necessary for us” [Instruction no. 1].  Confidence in divine providence is not based on a generic act of faith in God; it arises from a consideration of specific attributes in God, which render Him worthy of this act of trust in difficult circumstances.  Divine power, wisdom, and goodness permit the believer to understand why God, and only God, merits such a total act of faith and hope.

The divine attributes hold a particular prominence in De Chantal’s account of the faithful soul’s destiny after death.  In the beatific vision of God, the soul will contemplate the divine attributes it has only obscurely glimpsed during the laborious meditations of terrestrial life.  Divine goodness, immensity, and majesty are the particular objects of this celestial vision.  “When we shall be in possession of the glory of paradise, how great will be our astonishment on seeing the infinite goodness, the incomprehensible immensity, and the supreme majesty of God, who has lowered Himself so far as to desire the love of the creature, which is so vile and cruel!  If the soul were capable of dying, it would die at the sight of this excessive love, this immense greatness of its Creator, which has so favored it.  It would see how badly it has corresponded to this love and the wrong it did itself in being taken up with the things of life, with trifles which had the power to separate it from its God and make it lose the incomparable good of this immortal happiness and of the vision of the divine essence” [Conference no. 20].  The passage has echoes of the Augustinian theory of the ideas in the mind of God.  The infinite goodness, limitlessness, and majesty, which were perceived in an indirect and fleeting way during moments of terrestrial reflection, are now immediately grasped in the soul’s undying contemplation of the divine essence.  This beatific vision does not only contemplate God in all of the divine simplicity, it contemplates the eternal ideas that constitute God’s attributes.

d. Augustinianism

Augustinian influence suffuses the works of De Chantal.  After François de Sales, Saint Augustine is the most cited author in her writings.  Her theory of concupiscence and of divine ideas bears Augustinian traces.  Her Augustinianism emerges most clearly in her commentary on the Rule of Saint Augustine, delivered as a series of exhortations to the Visitation nuns.

The Rule of Saint Augustine is actually a compilation of documents written by Augustine of Hippo himself and by later Augustinian writers.  Saint Augustine authored Letter 211 to a community of nuns seeking to reform themselves and Sermons 355 and 356 on the life and death of clerics.  Aelred of Rievaulx composed Of the Eremitical Life in the twelfth century.  The authorship of Monastic Consortia, Rule for Clerics, and Second Rule remains uncertain.  The Rule of Saint Augustine describes the virtues of religious life but provides few detailed prescriptive laws.  When confronted by the proliferation of religious orders, the Catholic Church insisted that new orders must use one of the preexisting rules as the basis for their constitutions; many chose The Rule of Saint Augustine on account of its brevity and its flexibility.  The Visitation order chose the rule and adapted it to its own purposes.  De Chantal’s commentaries on the text transpose the rule in a gendered key by adapting it to the requirements of an exclusively female community.  Her exhortations echo the Neo-Platonism of Augustine himself by her repeated efforts to interpret physical realities in light of the spiritual realities or ideas to which they point.

Following Augustine, De Chantal designates love as the principal end and rule of religious community.  “In this Rule St. Augustine proposes to us, in the first place, the great commandment of God, and tells us that ‘God is to be loved before all things and after Him our neighbor.’  This commandment then must needs be the foundation and the basis of our perfection, for in the observance of this lies the sum of Christian and religious perfection” [Exhortation no. 1.1].  All the moral precepts of the Christian life are subsumed under the single commandment to love God and to love one’s neighbor.

Practical in orientation, De Chantal uses Augustine’s counsels on love as a criterion for an examination of conscience by the nuns.  The moral weaknesses of the community reflect the lack of fidelity to the demanding love proposed by the gospel and the Augustinian rule.  “Do we never do to our neighbor anything but what we wish should be done to ourselves?   Are we as pleased with her welfare as we are with our own?  Do we truly hide her faults? Are we indeed pliant toward all her wishes?  Have we a sense of her sorrows?  Are we very careful to console, serve, and comfort him?  No!  We commonly wish to be preferred to her; nevertheless, you see what this commandment obliges us to do” (Exhortation no. 1.1).  The Augustinian ideal of disinterested love becomes the measure by which the actions of community members are to be judged and corrected.

Addressing a convent audience, De Chantal specifies how the Augustinian norm of love is to be pursued by the nuns.  Her distinction between spiritual and natural love is gendered inasmuch as it cites personality traits traditionally associated with women rather than men.  “In a few words, St. Augustine tells us excellently how we must love our Sisters: ‘Now, there ought not to be any sensual love among us, but only spiritual love.’  This is the point: Do not love each other with natural, sensual fondness, founded on frivolous qualities, such as relationship, alliance, familiarity, correspondence, resemblance, mental sympathy, temperamental similarity, and a thousand other foolish things imagined by the human mind.  In the same way, our minds should banish such follies as natural beauty and the charms of good breeding.  We are to love our Sisters, not with a human love, not with a self-interested love, but as our holy Rule says, with ‘spiritual affection,’ with a certain interior and cordial attachment to virtue and not to other things” [Exhortation no. 1.14].  In this pursuit of spiritual love, the nuns should pay particular attention to their conduct during conversation.  Gossip and backbiting can prove particularly destructive in the conventual pursuit of a properly purified love.

At the antipodes of this spiritual love is the self-love that fosters a spiritual dishonesty.  Focusing on the specific challenges of conventual life, De Chantal describes how coyness in dealing with illness can subtly manifest this self-love.  “I want to … speak of a certain whimsicalness of self-love which creeps into some community members.  When they have something amiss, they will not tell it to their superior; someone else must tell it.  This behavior can proceed from no other cause but pride.  There is a wish to appear very generous and not to tell one’s ailment, but it must be made known.  To stand now on one foot, now on the other, to rub one’s forehead, to appear out of breath … I declare that when I see such trickiness, I will  simply avoid you.  I will let you suffer with your self-love and act as though I did not see you” [Exhortation no. 1.11].  Self-love is often expressed as emotional immaturity and veiled attention-seeking.  A spiritual love can emerge in the convent only if the superior firmly refuses to acknowledge demands for loving attention rooted in self-pity.

In numerous passages De Chantal follows the Neo-Platonic logic of Augustine by interpreting physical objects as the sign or embodiment of spiritual realities.  Her treatment of poverty is typical.  Augustine’s modest, concrete counsel to “keep all your clothes in one place, under the keeping of one or two Sisters” becomes the occasion for De Chantal to expand on a completely spiritualized concept of poverty.  Rather than a being a virtue confined to the treatment of material objects, poverty emerges as a virtue of strict spiritual detachment.  “In what do you think the purest poverty and finest observation of this virtue consists?  It consists, not only in having nothing of our own and in not being attached to what is given for our use, but it makes us rejoice in the lack of necessary things and that the least thing in the house is given to us … It stretches into the very recesses of the heart, unclothing the soul of the things that are most savory and spiritual, leading it to practice an excellent poverty of spirit, depriving it of the ardent superfluous desires of perfection, hiding from it its advances, and making it suffer with submission nakedness and withdrawal of interior goods” [Exhortation no. 1.7]. This spiritual poverty lies in a will completely abandoned to God’s good pleasure and no longer solicitous of either physical or spiritual consolations.

The Neo-Platonic strain of Augustinianism also emerges in De Chantal’s concept of God and the soul.  Both God and the soul are described under the rubric of the transcendental of beauty.  “We are enamored of spiritual beauty.  Now, you know that the nature of the will is such that as soon as it has discovered some fair and lovable object, it at once desires to possess and enjoy it.  All beauty, all goodness, all perfection, come down from God, who is supremely beautiful, good, and perfect.  This goodness which is in Him leads Him to communicate to the souls who serve Him some particles of these virtues … We shall arrive at the enjoyment of that spiritual beauty, more to be desired than all the delights of the palace” [Exhortation no. 1.18].  Framed in aesthetic terms, the soul’s pursuit of God emerges as the quest for infinite beauty, which gradually embellishes the soul with virtues as the questing soul becomes more like the image of perfect beauty, God.

4. Reception and Interpretation

The reception of the philosophy of De Chantal falls roughly into two periods.  Until the twentieth century, interest in De Chantal’s writings was largely devotional.  The Visitation order was the primary public for her writings.  The Annecy convent’s edition of the complete works of De Chantal (1874-1879) indicates the veneration accorded by the Visitation nuns toward the writings of their foundress.  By a quirk of ecclesiastical history, the Visitation order, reduced to strict cloister in the seventeenth century, began to conduct schools in the nineteenth century.  The students and alumnae of the Visitation academies become avid readers of the works of De Chantal and practitioners of her spirituality.

In the twentieth century a more scholarly approach toward the writings of De Chantal emerged.  Brémond (1912) presented De Chantal as a spiritual theologian with a complex variation on the Salesian theme of abandonment to divine providence.  Georges-Thomas (1963) and Ravier (1983) further pursued the exploration of De Chantal’s ascetical and mystical theology.  Gazier (1915) studied the relationship of De Chantal to Jansenism; Mézard (1928) analyzed her doctrine of the soul; Giraud (1929) considered the relationship of her writing style to her spirituality.  Recent studies have explored certain philosophical themes in De Chantal.  Wright (1988) and Bowden (1995) examine the gendered nature of her moral arguments; Bouchard (2004) and Kroug (2010) evaluate her philosophy of love; Wright (1985) considers her concept of perfection.  De Chantal’s philosophy of virtue and her relationship to the Augustinian revival of the seventeenth century invite further research.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • De Chantal, Ste Jeanne Françoise Frémyot. Sa vie et ses oeuvres, 8 vols., ed. Religieuses du Premier Monastère de la Visitation Sainte-Marie d’Annecy. Paris: Plon, 1874-1879.
    • Based primarily on manuscripts archived at the Visitation motherhouse in Annecy, this edition of the works of De Chantal still remains the standard text of reference.
  • De Chantal, Jeanne-Françoise Frémyot. Correspondance, 6 vols., ed. Patricia Burns. Paris: Cerf, 1986-1996.
    • This critical edition of the letters of De Chantal clarifies many strands of her spiritual theology and provides biographical information on her many correspondents.
  • De Chantal, Saint Jane Frances Frémyot. Selected Letters of Saint Jane Frances de Chantal, ed. Visitandines of Harrow-on-the-Hill. London: Washbourne, 1918.
    • This anthology highlights those letters tied to the foundation and direction of the Visitation order.
  • De Chantal, Saint Jane Frances Frémyot. Exhortations, Conferences and Instructions, ed. Visitandines of Bristol. Chicago: Loyola University Press, 1928.
    • This anthology offers the addresses of De Chantal, most of which were delivered to assemblies of Visitation nuns in Annecy.
  • De Sales, Francis and De Chantal, Jane. Letters of Spiritual Direction, trans. Péronne Marie Thibert, eds. Wendy M. Wright and Joseph F. Power. New York: Paulist Press, 1988.
    • Especially helpful is Wright’s essay on the gendered differences between the spiritual teaching of De Sales and that of De Chantal.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Brémond, Henri. Sainte Chantal 1572-1641. Paris: Lecoffre, 1912.
    • This groundbreaking presentation of De Chantal as a spiritual theologian was placed on the Index of Forbidden Books.  During the modernist controversy, the author was criticized for giving an account of Catholicism that placed too great an emphasis on subjective religious experience.
  • Bouchard, Françoise. Sainte Jeanne de Chantal ou la puissance d’aimer. Paris: Salvator, 2004.
    • The monograph analyzes De Chantal’s philosophy of love.
  • Bowden, Nancy Jayne. “Ma Très Chère Fille”: The Spirituality of Francis de Sales and Jane de Chantal and the Enablement of Women.  Ph.D. thesis, University of Washington, 1995.
    • From a feminist perspective, the dissertation examines the ways in which De Chantal’s philosophy promotes a mitigated emancipation of women.
  • Gazier, Augustin. Jeanne de Chantal et Angélique Arnauld d’après leur correspondance. Paris: Champion, 1915.
    • A partisan of Jansenism, Gazier studies the relationship between De Chantal and one of the leading Jansenist nuns through an analysis of their correspondence.
  • Georges-Thomas, Marcelle. Sainte Chantal et la Spiritualité Salésienne. Paris: Éditions Saint-Paul, 1963.
    • The commentary on this anthology of De Chantal writings examines her concept of the soul and her relationship to the broader Salesian movement.
  • Giraud, Victor. Sainte Jeanne de Chantal. Paris: Flammarion, 1928.
    • A literary critic, Victor examines the relationship between De Chantal’s spiritual doctrine and her writing style.
  • Kroug, Jean-Marie. Le désir de l’amant; le vocabulaire amoureux de quelques femmes mystiques au dix-septième siècle. Ph.D. Thesis: Université de Fribourg, 2010.
    • The dissertation compares De Chantal’s philosophy of love with that defended by other women mystics of the period.
  • Mézard, Denys. La Doctrine spirituelle de Sainte Jeanne-Françoise de Chantal. Paris: Lethielleux, 1928.
    • A Dominican theologian, Mézard analyzes the ascetical and mystical theology of De Chantal.
  • Ravier, André. Jeanne-Françoise Frémyot, Baronne de Chantal, sa race et sa grâce. Paris: Henry Labat, 1983.
    • A Jesuit specialist in spirituality, Ravier studies the social context of De Chantal and of her conception of the spiritual life.
  • Stopp, Elisabeth. Madame de Chantal: Portrait of a Saint. London: Faber and Faber, 1963.
    • This erudite biography remains an excellent introduction to De Chantal, with a good exploration of the intellectual influences on her.
  • Stopp, Elisabeth. Hidden in God―Essays and Talks on St. Jane Frances de Chantal. Philadelphia: Saint Joseph’s University Press, 1999.
    • Especially helpful is the study on the value of hiddenness and obscurity in the philosophy of De Chantal.
  • Wright, Wendy M. Bond of Perfection: Jean de Chantal and Francis de Sales. New York, Paulist Press, 1985.
    • This work studies the spiritual friendship between De Sales and De Chantal, as well as the concept of spiritual perfection to which they aspired.


Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University Maryland
U. S. A.

Kristina Wasa (1626—1689)

WasaThe flamboyant life of Kristina, the Queen of Sweden, one of Europe’s most mercurial monarchs, has long overshadowed her contribution to philosophy. When histories of philosophy mention her at all, they usually present her as the pupil of Descartes and as the patron of philosophical salons. But Kristina’s relationship to philosophy transcends her auxiliary roles.  In her writings she makes her own distinctive contribution to moral and political philosophy. Her ethical texts explore the nature of virtue, defend gender equity, and posit criteria for religious truth. Her political works defend the civic tolerance of religious minorities. Like many a salonnière of the period, Kristina analyzes the nature and variations of love, but her theological and political interests provide her with a broader philosophical horizon than the predominantly romantic one of many French salons. Her philosophical work often explores the issue which bedeviled her political career: the nature and proper exercise of authority.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Critic of Descartes
    2. Moral Philosophy
      1. Critic of La Rochefoucauld
      2. Moral Psychology
      3. Sexual Equality
      4. Epistemology
      5. Political Philosophy
      6. Religious Philosophy
      7. Philosophical Eclecticism
    3. Apologist for Tolerance
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born on December 8, 1626, Kristina Wasa belonged to the Swedish royal family. Her father was King Gustav II Adolf and her mother Maria Eleonora of Brandenburg. The mother disdained her daughter, having hoped for a boy who would become king, but her father cherished the child, insisting on an exacting education for her.

In 1630 the king presented Kristina to the Swedish Estates as his successor to the throne. The army and the Estates ratified King Gustav’s proposal. The king appointed Chancellor Axel Oxenstierna as the regent of Sweden, to govern the nation during the king’s frequent military absences and to supervise Kristina until she reached her majority. King Gustav insisted that Kristina be provided with the princely education that would have been accorded a male heir. Headed by the theologian Johannes Matthiae, a group of tutors undertook the education of the crown princess. An irenic (peace-seeking) theologian whose views on pan-Christian unity disturbed the more sectarian Lutherans at court, Matthiae helped to form the young queen’s views on religious tolerance.

Killed at the battle of Lutzen in 1632, King Gustav was succeeded by Kristina on the Swedish throne. The young queen inherited an empire which included Finland, Estonia, and parts of Norway, Germany, and Russia. Kristina’s education intensified. She mastered a series of foreign languages: Latin, German, French, Italian, and Spanish. There is even evidence she knew some  Hebrew and Arabic. French would become her preferred language of written communication. She studied the major works of classical philosophy, indicating a predilection for the writings of the Stoics, notably Epictetus and Seneca. She also mastered the disciplines considered essential for a warrior king: equestrianship, fencing, and military strategy.

In 1640 Queen Kristina began to participate in the national government and attend meetings of the cabinet of ministers. In 1644 she reached her majority and was formally crowned as monarch of Sweden. She quickly moved to limit the influence of the regent Oxenstierna, who she believed had unnecessarily restricted her power during her minority. A patron of the arts and sciences, she pursued her dream of turning Stockholm into the Athens of the North. Fascinated by modern technology, she founded the first Swedish newspaper in 1645.

In 1646 Kristina began a correspondence with Descartes through the mediation of Pierre Chanut, the French ambassador to Sweden. The letters explored the nature of love, the question of the universe’s infinity, and the nature of the sovereign good. In 1648 she played a crucial role in ending the Thirty Years’ War with the Treaty of Westphalia. The controversial treaty attempted to resolve the religious quarrel among Protestants and Catholics by declaring that the religion of the state should be the religion of the one who rules the state.

During this period she also began to constitute her personal court of palace scholars. Isaac Vossius headed the coterie, which included Samuel Bochart, Nicholas Heinsius, Christian Ravius, Claudius Salmsius, and Johannes Scheffer. This predominantly Dutch circle of scholars adhered to the neo-Stoic theories defended by Justus Lipsius at the University of Leyden.  Her prize court scholar was Descartes. Arriving in Stockholm at Kristina’s invitation in 1650, Descartes tutored the queen in philosophy during 5:00 A.M. sessions at the palace in the freezing winter. Within four months, Descartes had died of pneumonia.

Kristina had often guardedly expressed her skepticism at the tenets of Lutheranism, the official Swedish state religion. In 1651 she began clandestine communications with the Jesuits Francesco Malines and Paolo Casati. She became more withdrawn and began to consider the possibility of abdication, for reasons which remain obscure. In June 1654 Kristina abdicated the Swedish throne and named her cousin Charles X Gustav as her successor. As soon as she left Swedish territory, she began a wandering journey across Europe, often baffling observers with her use of male clothing.

In 1655 Kristina converted to Catholicism. Publicizing this conversion of a monarch from the heart of Lutheran Europe, Pope Alexander VII greeted her with lavish ceremonies in Rome. Vatican circles provided the queen with an apartment and other financial benefits. Although Kristina would remain a practicing Catholic, her increasingly erratic behavior in Rome and rumors of her private skeptical remarks about religion later alienated her from church authorities.

After her Roman triumph, Kristina resumed her wandering through Europe. In 1656 she held a conference in France to debate issues concerning the essence and variations of love. She shocked public opinion with a visit to the most notorious courtesan of Paris, the Epicurean Ninon de Lenclos. In 1657 her political ambitions resurfaced. She plotted to take the throne of Naples. During a stay at Fontainebleau, she learned that one of her servants, Monaldeschi, had revealed her plot to her critics. She ordered the execution of the traitor in her presence, an act which shocked public opinion and intensified speculation on the former queen’s mental balance.

In 1660 Kristina visited her estates in Sweden. She later received tutorials in astronomy from Lubenitz. In 1667 she returned to Sweden with a new political project: a plan to have herself crowned the new queen of Poland. When the plan collapsed, she returned permanently to Rome and pursued her life as a writer and patron of the arts and sciences. In 1670 she began writing her maxim collections, Reasonable Sentiments and Heroic Sentiments. In 1686 her letter defending tolerance of the Huguenots was published in Pierre Bayle’s Nouvelles de la République des Lettres; she also wrote a manifesto defending tolerance for Roman Jews. She installed an astronomical observatory in her apartment and conducted a scientific academy which featured the astronomer Cassini and the physiologist Borelli. She founded a philosophical academy, served as a patron of the musicians Scarlatti and Corelli, and commissioned a book defending the controversial architect Bernini. Spiritually later in life, she indicated a sympathy for Quietism, a controversial mystical movement then agitating the Catholic world.

On April 19, 1689 Kristina died in Rome.

2. Works

A prolific writer, Kristina of Sweden left behind her a disparate collection of texts, written principally in French. Her immense correspondence includes epistolary exchanges with numerous philosophers, notably Descartes, Pascal, Gassendi, and Grotius. The many female correspondents include Anna Maria Van Schurman and Madeleine de Scudéry. Her uncompleted autobiography, modestly entitled The Life of Queen Kristina, Written by Herself, Dedicated to God, must be read with caution. Many incidents in the queen’s life are altered or embellished to suit the hagiographic purposes of the book. Kristina’s moral philosophy appears in three collections of maxims, laconic aphorisms inspired by the maxime literature of the salon of Madame de Sablé. They are Commentaries on the Maxims of La Rochefoucauld, Commonplace Book: Reasonable Sentiments, and Heroic Sentiments. In many ways the most typical of Kristina’s writings are two historical essays: Reflections on the Life and Actions of Alexander the Great and Reflections on the Life and Works of Caesar. They celebrate the historic models of the heroic life which Kristina considered the moral ideal of the monarch. Only with the edition of Johann Arckenholtz (1750-60) were the writings of Kristina presented as a unified canon.

3. Philosophical Themes

Kristina’s philosophical preoccupations are primarily ethical in nature. Like other salon philosophers, her interest in moral psychology pivots around the question of love and friendship. As a monarch, her virtue theory focuses on the heroic virtues which she believes essential for the successful ruler. Her political theory and religious philosophy emphasize the issue of authority and the legitimate use of power. Embedded in her moral philosophy are secondary epistemological and metaphysical concerns.

a. Critic of Descartes

Kristina’s philosophical dialogue with Descartes is pursued principally through the intermediary of Pierre Chanut, French ambassador to Sweden. Starting in 1646, a series of letters between Descartes and the monarch reveals Kristina as a critic of several key points of Cartesian philosophy.

The initial dialogue concerns the nature of love. Chanut presents Kristina in a vaguely Cartesian light as a being liberated from the constraints of tradition: “having the wonderful disposition of being freed from the servitude of popular opinion” [Letter of Chanut to Descartes; December 1, 1646]. He then poses Kristina’s question on love: “When we  use love or hatred poorly, which is the worse of these disorders or poor usages?  The term ‘love’ must be understood in a philosophical manner and not the way it is often understood in girlish talk” [Letter of Chanut to Descartes; December 1, 1646].

Descartes’s lengthy response is a veritable treatise on love. He subdivides Kristina’s question into three considerations: “1. What love is. 2. Whether the natural light alone teaches us to love God. 3. Which of the disorders and poor usages is worse: love or hate?” [Letter of Descartes to Chanut; February 1, 1647]. His response theologizes the questions. In presenting his theory of love, certain distinctive themes of Cartesian philosophy emerge. Inasmuch as love is simply a passion, it is only a mechanical response of the body to some desired external object. Love can become properly intellectual and more than a passion when human reason decides that some spiritual object should be possessed and deliberates on the means to possess it. The love of God is a particularly thorny issue since the divine attributes detected by natural reason alone (that is, reason unaided by supernatural revelation, faith, and grace) are minimal. Nonetheless, the human experience of free will enables the human agent to acquire some knowledge and love of God, since it is in the will that human beings most closely resemble God. Finally, disordered love is more dangerous than disordered hatred because disordered love more easily distorts our judgment.

Kristina’s response to the Cartesian theory of love is a mitigated assent. She admits that she could not respond properly to Descartes’s theory of love as a passion because “never having personally experienced this passion, she could not render a good judgment concerning a portrait when she had never known the original” [Letter of Chanut to Descartes; May 11, 1647]. However, Kristina agrees with Descartes’ theory of intellectual love since it closely resembles the love of virtue she has long tried to cultivate. “Nothing prevented her from examining what Monsieur Descartes said about intellectual love, which considers a good [that is] purified and separated from sensible things, since she could at least feel within herself the love of virtue” [Letter of Chanut to Descartes; May 11, 1647]. The Cartesian concept of intellectual love touched on the question of the sovereign good which had long interested the queen.

Kristina moves from the question of love to a new question concerning Descartes’ doctrine of the infinity of the world. Does not this theory dangerously confuse the difference between God and the creature?  Are not all created things, including the cosmos itself, strictly finite?  And does not such a theory contradict the clear teaching of the Church and Scripture on the finite nature of the world?

Descartes provides a cautious response to this fraught theological question. First, he insists that perfectly orthodox theologians, such as Nicolas of Cusa, have supported the theory of the world’s infinity. “I argue that the Cardinal of Cusa and several other theological doctors have believed the world to be infinite without any correction by the Church on this subject. On the contrary, it is actually honoring God to conceive His works in terms of such greatness” [Letter from Descartes to Chanut; June 6, 1647]. Second, he insists that he only supported the theory of the world’s indefiniteness, not its infinity. “I do not say that the world is infinite; I only say that it is indefinite. There is a very important difference here. To say that the world is infinite, one must have some reason in order to know it as such; one could only receive this from God. But to say that the world is indefinite, it is sufficient that one simply find no reasons by which one could prove it has limits” [Letter of Descartes to Chanut; June 6, 1647].

Descartes also answers Kristina’s previous ancillary question on love: How does one explain the experience of loving one person over another, especially the experience of spontaneous friendship, where one immediately loves a person one has never known?  Descartes’ response again draws on his mechanistic theory of the body and the brain. “[This attraction] consists in the disposition of the parts of our brain….The objects which touch our senses move through the intermediary of the nerves to some part of our brain….When we are drawn to love someone without knowing the cause, we can believe that this comes from something in the object which is similar to what was in a previous object we once loved” [Letter of Descartes to Chanut; June 6, 1647].

Kristina’s next question concerns the nature of the sovereign good. What is the supreme good for humanity?  Descartes’ answer hedges. He admits that properly speaking, only God is the sovereign good of humanity, but he is skeptical that this good could be grasped outside the light of faith. He argues that the sovereign good could be understood in another, secular manner. The sovereign good here is a collection of those goods a human agent could possess; preeminent among them is a good will. “It seems to me that the sovereign good of all human beings together is a collection or an assemblage of all the goods, whether of the body or of the soul or of fortune, which could exist in anyone…and the most important consists in a firm will to do what is right and to seek the happiness which this produces” [Letter of Descartes to Chanut; November 20, 1647].

In later correspondence, Descartes recognize that Kristina does not share all of his views on the sovereign good, despite their common interest in the Stoic literature where it had been previously explored. “The grand esteem that I have for this incomparable princess [Kristina] gives me the occasion to fear that having already taken the trouble to see it [the letter on the sovereign good], as you have stated, she still did not want to give me her opinion of it” [Letter of Descartes to Chanut; May, 1648]. Descartes fears that Kristina’s non-response indicates disapproval and that he might have erred in the opinions he defended concerning the sovereign good. “I see so many other people who are mistaken in their opinions and their judgments that it seems to me a universal illness” [Letter of Descartes to Chanut; May 1648].

In their few direct epistolary exchanges, Kristina and Descartes express the highest regard for each other. In the philosophical dialogue carried out through the intermediary of Chanut, however, the disagreements between the two thinkers are stronger than their agreements. Kristina clearly expresses her skepticism concerning Cartesian dualism, religious orthodoxy, and virtue theory.

b. Moral Philosophy

Kristina’s moral philosophy emerges in three works tied to the maxime literature of the salon. These are her Commentaries on the Maxims of La Rochefoucauld [CMLR] and her two collections of personal maxims, Reasonable Sentiments [RS] and Heroic Sentiments [HS]. Although the three works examine a number of ethical issues, they concentrate on questions of moral psychology, such as the virtues and the passions. They also reflect Kristina’s longstanding theological and political preoccupations.

i. Critic of La Rochefoucauld

In her commentary on La Rochefoucauld’s maxims, Kristina often indicates her agreement with his skeptical exposure of virtue as a mask for vice. But in many passages she indicates her opposition and sketches an alternative theory of human nature.

Kristina disagrees with La Rochefoucauld’s negative account of the passions. While La Rochefoucauld considers the passions strong emotions which distort human reason, Kristina places the passions at the summit of human perfection. “'Passion often turns the brightest man into a fool and often makes the greatest fools bright.’ I think that passion perfects everything” [CMLR no.1]. She also criticizes his misogynistic interpretation of how women deal with the passions. “'Women often believe they love although they do not love. Preoccupation with some intrigue, the heightened emotions of a romance, the natural inclination toward the pleasure of being loved and the pain of being refused such love convinces them they possess passion when they only experience some coquettishness.’  This could be true of either sex. There are very few people who are capable of authentic passion” [CMLR no.73]. The stereotype of the emotional woman opposed to the rational man is critiqued. Both genders are equally susceptible to passion and capable of rational reflection.

Kristina challenges the link established by La Rochefoucauld between passion and virtue. She does not believe that disordered emotion could cause or strengthen moral virtue. “’Passions often engender what is contrary to them. Avarice sometimes produces generosity and generosity avarice. We are often firm because we are weak and audacious out of timidity.’  I do not believe this at all” [CMLR no.4]. Not only is La Rochefoucauld’s link between virtue and passion faulty; Kristina challenges his concept of virtue itself. “'Virtue would not go so far if vanity did not hold company with it.’  Talking this way shows a poor knowledge of virtue. Virtue and vanity never find themselves housed together” [CMLR no.56]. Kristina rejects La Rochefoucauld’s witty paradoxes. Just as virtue is not a passion, it is not a vice nor does it share a mysterious kinship with the vices.

Similarly, Kristina corrects La Rochefoucauld’s account of the principal human passion: love. Against La Rochefoucauld’s cynical sociological account, Kristina emphasizes the power of love and its presence in the fundamental structure of the human person. “'There are people who would never have experienced loving feelings if they had never heard others speak about love.’  This is false. Love does not enter by the ear; it enters by the eye” [CMLR no.46]. Similarly, friendship deserves greater esteem than that given by La Rochefoucauld. Betrayal by a friend constitutes a grave injustice which justifies a thorough distrust of the former friend. “'It is more shameful to distrust one’s friends than to be betrayed by them.’ I do not agree. There are times when one may and one must distrust one’s friends without offending either friend or friendship. To be a traitor is the shame of those who do the betraying but to undergo the betrayal is our shame” [CMLR no.34]. Literary critics have long pointed out that many sympathetic female commentators on La Rochefoucauld strongly disagreed with his cynical account of love and friendship. Kristina’s critique is one example of this gendered dissent from La Rochefoucald’s theory of the emotions surrounding friendship.

Certain Cartesian phrases punctuate Kristina’s critique of La Rochefoucauld. The mechanistic theory of human nature is reflected in her discussion of La Rochefoucauld’s thesis that mental states are tightly linked to corporeal causes. “'Strength and weakness of mind are not well named. In fact, they are only the good or bad disposition of the organs of the body.’  There is such a great union between body and soul that even if some small thing is bothering this machine, everything goes wrong” [CMLR no.14]. The problem of the nature of the interaction between mind and body is raised.

ii. Moral Psychology

In Reasonable Sentiments and Heroic Sentiments, Kristina presents her own reflections on a series of moral, theological, and political issues. These collections of maxims must be interpreted with caution. The brief statements are fragmentary and often opaque. Like her political life, the maxims contain contradictions and abrupt transitions. Nonetheless, the hundreds of maxims indicate a pattern in Kristina’s thought on moral psychology and on questions of authority in politics and religion.

The theory of moral virtue defended by Kristina stresses the heroic virtues. The outsized virtues of conquerors represent the summit of moral habits. “Magnificence and liberality are the virtues of conquerors. They impress everyone” [RS no. 323]. Similarly, military courage inspires awe. “Invincible courage is troubled by nothing” [RS no.59]. The virtues of the heroic are not limited to the martial virtues displayed in public moments of triumph; the heroic moral agent often displays discreet virtues in the face of adversity. The capacity to accept ingratitude is one of the quieter virtues. “There is a type of pleasure in suffering ingratitude which is reserved to great souls, who alone are capable of relishing it” [RS no.31].

Her treatment of vices similarly focuses upon the world of the politically powerful. While the line between virtue and vice is clear, certain vices typical of rulers actually promote the common good in society. One such vice would be luxuriousness. While a taste for luxurious possessions might corrupt a ruler, it could embellish a society where the ruler acts as a patron of the arts and sciences. “Luxuriousness does not destroy states; it enriches and civilizes them” [RS no.338]. Despite its potential for personal corruption, the vice could have a charitable effect. “Luxuriousness is a type of secret alms” [RS no.239].

The passions constitute a particularly powerful influence upon the moral agent. Not only are they necessary; they provide a positive vitality to the human person. “The passions are the salt of life. Life would be insupportable without them” [RS no.148]. Kristina criticizes those neo-Stoic philosophers who consider it possible and desirable for the soul to live in a state of equanimity freed from all emotion. “This tranquility so vaunted by philosophers is a dull and insipid mental state” [RS no.149]. Even momentary liberation from the sway of passion is rare. “We only triumph over our passions when they are weak” [RS no.160]. Despite their central and positive role in human psychology, the passions can easily mislead the moral agent. Certain passions easily align themselves with vice. “Avarice and envy are ridiculous passions” [RS no.161]. Even hope, a passion often aligned with theological virtue, can bitterly disappoint a moral agent possessed by it. “Hope is the passion which gives the falsest pleasure and the truest sadness” [RS no.153].

The passion receiving the most extensive analysis by Kristina is love. Love possesses an incomparable intensity and duration. Even when it has faded, it permanently marks the moral subject. “Whether love is happy or unhappy, it always endures” [HS no. 71]. Love is so powerful that it defines the personality of the one who loves. “As our love is so we are” ([RS no.15]. Despite its power, love is rare. The greatest of affective relationships, friendship is difficult to find and sustain. “Great friendships are as rare as great loves” [RS no.182].

According to Kristina, authentic love is ultimately religious. Only in God can the human lover find the perfect and imperishable object of love’s drive. “Love and ambition must have God as their aim. Only in Him can they find what will abundantly and worthily satisfy them” [HS no.62]. Love can never remain at the level of the purely intra-human. The dynamic transcendence of love toward the most infinite and lovable of beings inevitably leads it to a religious object. “When a heart is capable of love, it is impossible that sooner or later it will not love God, Who alone is capable of fulfilling it and lifting it up” [HS no.84].

In light of her theory of love, Kristina severely criticizes the institution of marriage. The practice of arranged marriages for the sake of social prestige or economic gain guarantees that marriage will usually be loveless. “There are no happy marriages because the spouses do not truly love each other” [RS no.168]. The lack of affection between spouses renders marital commitment impossible to bear. “Marriage is insupportable because it is nearly always incompatible with love” [RS no.169]. So bereft of love are most marriages in the society of the period that the existence of a happy marriage is a moral miracle. “It would be too much happiness to be both married and in love” [RS no.168].

Kristina builds her critique of marriage into a defense of the superiority of the single life. “Socrates said, ‘Whether you are married or unmarried, you will be sorry.’ Personally, I believe infallibly that everyone who marries will regret doing so, but I do not see why anyone who is unmarried will regret it. I am the example from experience” [HS no.111]. In her praise of the single life, Kristina’s philosophical argument becomes autobiographical.

iii. Sexual Equality

In her treatment of the relationship between the sexes, Kristina’s maxims show a marked ambiguity. Many maxims insist upon strict gender equality, but several maxims argue that women are not fit to serve as political rulers.

In the more egalitarian maxims Kristina insists that the biological difference between men and women neither indicates any intellectual difference nor dictates any particular social role for either sex. Seat of the intellect and will, the soul has no gender. “It is true that the soul has no sex” [RS no.268]. So separate is the soul from the body that the traditional social roles assigned to each sex are easily violated. “There are men who are as much women as their mothers and women who are as much men as their fathers, because the soul has no sex” [RS no.266]. The observable differences in intellectual achievement and social position between men and women can be explained by social institutions, especially by the period’s educational institutions. “Temperament and education explain all the differences one can observe between the two sexes” [RS no.270]. The argument for gender equity carries echoes of the Cartesian thesis that the mind remains a completely separate substance from the body and thus unmarked by gender.

In other passages, however, Kristina insists that one type of work should be closed to women: that of political governance. “Women must not reign” [RS no.261]. The rule of women in the past is dismissed as untypical; the exceptions of female political rule in the past only prove the wisdom of limiting rule to men. “If in the past there were queens who gloriously reigned, these examples are so rare that we shouldn’t rely on such miracles” [RS no.263]. The political rule of women in the present is only the occasion for mockery. “Nothing is more ridiculous than government by women. I knew several cases which reduced me and still reduce me to pity” [RS no.264]. Given Kristina’s own efforts to exercise political sovereignty in Naples and Poland, these maxims against female rule are difficult to explain. They clearly reflect her own contrarian spirit or possibly her bitter experience of rule during her tenure as queen of Sweden. Still, they stand in counterpoint to the sexual equality she champions in her broader reflections on gender.

iv. Epistemology

In Kristina’s theory of knowledge, practical is to be preferred to speculative knowledge. Despite her interest in recent scientific discoveries, empirical science seems to be of little value. “The sciences are only pompous titles for human ignorance. One is not any wiser for knowing them” [RS no.46]. Only moral knowledge can truly render human beings wise and direct them to genuine happiness. “Everything which does not render humanity wiser and happier is useless in the area of science” [RS no.47]. The supreme science is that which teaches a certain wisdom of life. “Knowing how to live well and die well is the science of sciences” [RS no.48].

In this science of wise living, one diplomatic art is pre-eminent: the art of being able to understand the psychological motivation of others. This art provides the key to effective government of others. “The art of penetrating other human beings is rare, but those who possess it are made to rule” [RS no.82]. Even when used by a mature agent, this psychological science is difficult to wield successfully. “One must employ this art with discretion and not believe it to be infallible” [RS no.83]. Historical knowledge can also assist the moral agent who is attempting to govern others through the use of psychological insight. “The science of the past is very useful for the future” [RS no.81].

Unsurprisingly, for Kristina the supreme knowledge is the science of governing others well. This knowledge rests upon a combination of psychological and historical science. Given its capacity to promote human happiness, the science of government enjoys a pre-eminence over other sciences, whose truths have little direct impact upon the practical life of humanity.

v. Political Philosophy

Kristina’s political philosophy focuses on the question of authority and sovereignty. The prosperity of the state depends upon the character and skill of its ruler. The ideal political regime is an absolutist one where an audacious ruler has acquired heroic virtues.

Moral character determines the political power of a ruler. “It is personal merit, not differences between states, which explains the difference between kings” [HS no.30]. In the constellation of personal virtues a sense of grandeur is the most indispensable for a successful reign. “Princes must love their grandeur above all things” [RS no.315].

History has provided a series of rulers who demonstrate this political grandeur to a heroic level. “If [Julius] Caesar, Alexander [the Great], and Cyrus [of Persia] once succeeded in making themselves masters of a part of the world, it is because they had all the necessary qualities to a heroic degree” [HS no.128]. Despite her censure of women who exercise political rule, Kristina includes female rulers in her catalogue of heroic governance. “Semiramis and Cleopatra and so many others earned esteem and admiration despite their personal faults” [RS no.275].

In exercising rule, the monarch must not fail to use absolute authority. This can even include the execution of members of his own family if the security of the state is at stake. The controversial action of Spain’s Phillip II in authorizing the death of his son receives Kristina’s praise. “If it is true that Phillip II brought about the death of his only son either out of reasons of jealous love or out of reasons of state, that is a great gesture” [RS no.316]. The praised action carries an eerie echo of the controversial execution of Monaldeschi at Kristina’s command.

The absolute authority of the monarch is not arbitrary. A heroic ruler must represent the interests of the entire nation he governs and must refuse to be the agent of one partisan faction. The ruler can only encourage justice by publicly acting justly. “A prince must be perfectly neutral. His only concern should be to reign and to render justice according to the merit of each subject, thus obliging everyone through proper punishments and rewards, but chiefly by his own example, to do one’s duty with care, application, and fidelity” [RS no.120]. To ensure this commitment to the common rather than the partisan good, the ruler must consult as widely as possible. “A prince must give everyone access to him. He must be as publicly exposed to everyone’s gaze as is the sun. He must not let himself be isolated by either his ministers or his favorites” [RS no.121].

The ideal ruler must be cultured as well as virtuous. A commitment to personal learning is essential for the success of a political reign. “It is the duty of the prince to give some of his time to the reading of good books. These times are not taken away from his public duties because they instruct and correct princes” [HS no.42]. The daily moments of retreat must also serve to permit the ruler to engage in personal reflection on his conduct in office. “No matter how busy the prince is, it is necessary for him to put aside several hours of retreat each day. This time must be used to reflect on his conduct, to correct his faults, and to ask strength and grace from God, without which nothing valuable can be done” [HS no.122]. The ruler must not only develop a personal intellectual and spiritual culture; the ruler must act as a patron of arts in the conduct of government. “It is necessary to know how to use cultured people as if they were living libraries, esteem them, reward them liberally, employ them and consult them on what they know” [HS no.123]. This portrait of the ruler as cultured patron of the arts is the standard Renaissance portrait of the good prince. It is also a self-portrait of Kristina in her ambition to be both a learned monarch and to transform her nation into a center for European high culture.

The absolute authority of the ruler has religious limits. The good ruler must recognize that political authority comes from God and that God will demand an account from each ruler on how that authority has been used. “A prince who rules must make God rule everywhere where he exercises command. He must give back to God all his greatness and all his glory and all his works. He must make of them a perpetual homage to God” [HS no.12]. Authentic political rule is thus a kind of regency; the source and end of the authority exercised by the political ruler resides in God alone.

vi. Religious Philosophy

Like her political philosophy, Kristina’s religious philosophy focuses on the issue of authority. The truth of Catholicism is found in the authority with which God has vested it. Salvation is found only in submission to the Church’s authority. “God only explains His will by his unique oracle, which is the Roman Catholic Church, outside of which there is no salvation. One must submit oneself blindly and without reservation to all of its decrees” [HS no.1].

Her concept of ecclesiastical authority is militantly ultramontane; it is papal authority which is supreme in the Church’s governance. Unlike other Catholic authors of the period, who considered ecumenical councils equal with or superior to the pope in the Church’s government, Kristina exalts the monarchial governance of the Church in the person of the bishop of Rome. “God wanted to give authority to the pope and the Church in such an admirable way, by so many miracles, so many councils, and so many other marvels that no reasonable person can doubt the fulfillment of the magnificent promise God made that Church will prevail over hell until the end of time. He wanted the government of His Church to be monarchial. He has given His infallibility to the pope and not to councils. The pope is everything without them and they are nothing without him” [HS no.2]. As in the political order, where the monarch exercises absolute authority, the pope alone must exercise absolute authority in the religious order. The pope is only accountable to God for his actions.

The submission of intellect and will to the teachings of the Church is accompanied by a spiritual abandonment of the soul to God’s will. Echoing the Quietist movement which had interested her for a time, abandonment to divine providence is a central spiritual posture. “One must blindly resign oneself to God’s will in time and in eternity” [RS no.349]. This abandonment is so important and difficult that Kristina describes it as a type of martyrdom to divine providence.

Despite her enthusiasm for Catholicism in its most Roman forms, Kristina criticizes the omnipresent abuses of religion. The devout who want to believe in supernatural occurrences beyond those essential to the Catholic creed easily fall into superstition. An enlightened faith can never be confused with credulity. Many maxims denounce the hypocrisy of the overly devout. “Bigots are very concerned about the sins of their neighbors but they show little concern about their own” [RS no.374]. Kristina expresses skepticism about members of religious orders. “Too many people are making vows of chastity to be able to keep them actually” [RS no.379]. She also criticizes the clericalism of the devout. The vogue of many cultured Catholics for long interviews with spiritual directors illegitimately reduces personal freedom. “We should not be the dupes of confessors or of spiritual directors” [RS no.366]. Kristina’s enthusiasm for the institution of the papacy does not eliminate her rationalist skepticism toward certain practices of her new religious community.

vii. Philosophical Eclecticism

In the presentation of her moral positions in the maxims, Kristina reveals her indebtedness to other philosophers. Strikingly, Kristina makes no mention of Descartes or of the other modern philosophers she had clearly known or read. She references only classical philosophers. Although the philosophers cited represent an eclectic group of thinkers defending some mutually exclusive theories, Kristina leans toward the more Stoic philosophers as her guides.

The philosophers praised by Kristina are eclectic in their orientation. “Among philosophers, Socrates, Plato, Aristotle, Diogenes, Epicurus, and Epictetus merit admiration” [RS no.63]. Few students of philosophy simultaneously admire both Plato and Aristotle, both Epicureans and Stoics. “Among philosophers, Socrates, Aristippus, and Diogenes are strongly to my taste” [HS no. 33]. Few philosophers believe that the dialectics of Socrates, the Cyrenaic philosophy of Aristippus, and the Cynicism of Diogenes can be reconciled. Kristina’s philosophical heroes indicate the somewhat contradictory philosophical eclecticism she often espoused in her writings.

In other maxims, Kristina indicates a preference for the Stoic strand of classical philosophy. The Stoic philosopher Epictetus is singled out for particular praise. “Born a slave, the wise Epictetus proved himself so illustrious that he made his slave irons more glorious than many others have made their scepters” [HS no.142]. Kristina’s emphasis on the will and its virtuous fortification against adversity indicate her sympathy with the neo-Stoicism of the period.

c. Apologist for Tolerance

Despite the absolutism of her political philosophy, Krisitina emerged as a major European theorist of religious tolerance. In her final years she defended two persecuted religious minorities: French Protestants and Roman Jews. Published by Pierre Bayle, her celebrated letter condemning the persecution of French Huguenots indicates the humanitarian and pragmatic nature of her theory of tolerance.

First, the renewed persecution of the Protestants contradicts the sentiments of charity and compassion which should be the preeminent virtues of the Catholic Church and its adherents. “I pity so many ruined families, so many honest people reduced to dependence on charity. I cannot look at what is happening today in France without being deeply shaken. I feel sorry that these people were born in religious error, but they seem to me more worthy of pity than of hatred. Just as I would not share their error for all the kingdoms of the world, I would not want to cause them any unhappiness” [Letter of Kristina to Terlon; February 2, 1686].

Second, this violent policy of forced conversion will only damage rather than benefit the church. The military campaign against the Huguenots will harden the image of the church as a persecutor and ultimately drive would-be converts away from it. “Because you want to know my sentiments concerning the alleged wiping out of heresy in France, I am delighted to tell you what I think…..I frankly admit that I am not at all convinced of the success of that great plan. I cannot perceive in it anything which will bring a benefit to our holy religion. On the contrary, I can only envision the prejudice against the Church which this novel way of proceeding will give rise to” [Letter of Kristina to Terlon; February 2, 1686]. The apparent military victory in forcing religious conversions only discredits religion.

4. Reception and Interpretation

The reception of Kristina of Sweden has been both popular and scholarly. Even before her death, the dark legend of Queen Kristina had begun to circulate. Her execution of Monaldeschi, a legal punishment of a traitor by a reigning monarch (due to her sovereignty over several fiefs she maintained in Sweden after her abdication), was presented as the irrational deed of a bloodthirsty tyrant. Her taste for male attire was attacked as a sign of lesbianism. Her Platonic friendship with Cardinal Azzolino was denounced as a sordid liaison within the walls of the Vatican. Countless anti-Catholic Swedish pamphlets decried Kristina’s conversion to Catholicism as part of a Jesuit plot to destroy Protestantism in Scandinavia.

The image of Kristina as an irrational virago has influenced popular artistic portraits of her. Countless novels and fictionalized biographies have emphasized the willfulness and eccentricities of her personality. August Strindberg’s play Kristina (1901), Rouben Mamoulian’s film Queen Christina (1933), Anthony Harvey’s film The Abdication (1974), and Laura Ruohonen’s play Queen C (2002) circulate some of the fictitious elements of the legendary Kristina.

A more scholarly approach began with Johann Arckenholtz’s edition (1750-60) of writings by and about Kristina. This multivolume work permitted readers to study the actual writings of Kristina and to counter the legends surrounding the queen by reading eyewitness testimonies by close associates. Varied philosophical interpretations of Kristina’s thought have been offered. Gaukroger’s biography of Descartes (1995) stresses the personal philosophical culture of Kristina as well as her relationship with Descartes. Raymond (1993) emphasizes the centrality of the concept of sacred royalty in his study of the Descartes-Kristina relationship. Pintard (1943) and Åckerman (1991) analyze the libertine and skeptical dimensions of Kristina’s philosophy. Åckerman also stresses the Stoic character of the queen’s philosophical outlook. Børresen (1996, 2007) studies her religious thought, with attention to its paradoxical nature. Kristina’s heroic concept of moral virtue invites further research.

5. References and Further Reading

Translations from French to English above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Christine de Suède. Mémoires concernant Christine, Reine de Suède, 4 vols., ed. Johann Arckenholtz. Amsterdam: Mortier, 1750-60.
    • This groundbreaking collection of writings by and about Kristina challenged the legends which had grown up around her since her death. A digital version of this work is available in the Gallica section of the webpage of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.
  • Christine de Suède. Apologies: Christine de Suède, ed. Jean-François de Raymond. Paris: Cerf, 1994.
    • This contemporary edition of Kristina’s French writings is a useful introduction to her work, especially her unreliable autobiography.
  • Christine de Suède. Maximes, ed. Chantal Thomas. Paris: Payot & Rivages, 1996.
    • Thomas’ introduction ably underscores the absolutist nature of Kristina’s thought.
  • Christina of Sweden, The works of Christina, Queen of Sweden, Containing maxims and sentences, in twelve centuries: and reflections on the actions of Alexander the Great; first translation from the French. Farmington Hills, MI: Gale ECCO, 2010; reprint of London 1753 translation.
    • This reprint of the 1753 English translation of Kristina’s works contains her maxims and historical essays.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Åckerman, Susanna. “Kristina Wasa, Queen of Sweden,” in A History of Women Philosophers, Vol. 3, ed. Mary Ellen Waithe. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1991: 21-40.
    • This study stresses the neo-Stoic roots of Kristina’s philosophy but the effort to present Kristina as a religious skeptic is less convincing.
  • Åckerman, Susanna. Queen Christina of Sweden and her Circle: The Transformation of a Seventeenth-Century Philosophical Libertine. Leiden: Brill, 1991.
    • This monograph contextualizes the philosophy of Kristina by placing it within the broader libertine circle of her associates.
  • Børessen, Kari Elisabeth, “Concordia Discors: La pensée de Christine de Suède sur Dieu et l’humanité,” Augustinianum 36 (1996): 237-254.
    • This study draws out the paradoxical nature of Kristina’s religious philosophy.
  • Børessen, Kari Elisabeth, “Christine de Suède: Autonomie et foi rationelle,” in Scandinavian Critique of Anglo-American Feminist Theology, eds. Stenström, Vuola, Bieberstein, and Rapp. Leuven: Peters, 2007: 163-176.
    • This essay interprets Kristina’s abdication and conversion as an effort to develop a personal, autonomous faith which corresponds to her own free use of reason rather than to the demands of Swedish royal tradition.
  • Cassirer, Ernst. Descartes, Corneille, Kristina. Paris: Vrin, 1942.
    • Written during his professorship at Gothenburg University in Sweden (1935-41), Cassirer’s study emphasizes Descartes’s influence on Kristina’s religious convictions. It tends to exaggerate Descartes’s role in the queen’s conversion to Catholicism.
  • Gaukroger, Stephen. Descartes: An Intellectual Biography. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995: 412-16.
    • Gaukroger’s sketch of Kristina stresses the complexity of her philosophical culture by the time she entered into dialogue with Descartes.
  • Pintard, René. Le libertinage érudit dans la première moitié du XVIIe siècle, 2 vols. Paris: Buin, 1943.
    • Pintard characterizes Kristina’s philosophy as libertine and skeptical.
  • Raymond, Jean-François de. La reine et le philosophe: Descartes et Christine de Suède. Paris: Lettres Modernes, 1993.
    • Raymond’s interpretation of the Kristina-Descartes relationship explores how Kristina’s understanding of the sacral nature of royalty influenced her approach to philosophy.
  • Rodén, Marie-Louise. Church Politics in Seventeenth-Century Rome: Cardinal Decio Azzolino, Queen Christina of Sweden and the Squadrone Volante. Stockholm: Almqvist & Wichsell, 2000.
    • This monograph contextualizes Kristina’s philosophy by situating it within the theological and political concerns of the Roman ecclesiastical coterie in which Kristina participated.
  • Rodén, Marie-Louise. Queen Christina. Stockholm: Swedish Institute, 1998.
    • This biography is a solid introduction to Kristina from a literary perspective.


Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University Maryland
U. S. A.

William David Ross (1877—1971)

W D RossSir William David Ross was a British philosopher, college administrator, WW I veteran, civil servant, and humanities scholar best known for his important contributions to moral philosophy and the study of classical literature. In the field of classical studies, in addition to shorter works on Plato and Aristotle, his major triumph was his editorship of the Oxford English translations of Aristotle’s complete works, a production of historic magnitude and impact. In moral philosophy, in addition to a short critique of Kantian ethics, his great accomplishment was the formulation of a major new ethical theory, a unique and still controversial system that combines deontological pluralism, ethical intuitionism, non-naturalism, and so-called prima facie duties. Taken as a whole, Ross’s work represents an impressive and in some respects singular and unprecedented achievement. Indeed, apart from Sir Isaiah Berlin who was his peer at Oxford University, it is hard to think of another modern British academic philosopher who similarly distinguished himself not only as a first-rate critic and original theorist, but also as a high-level scholar, educator, editor, translator, administrator, and public official. Dry, rigorous, unostentatious, Ross resembles Aristotle and Kant. Like them, he is seldom electrifying, but always thoughtful, provocative, and edifying. Certainly, the “worthy thane of Ross,” as his namesake is hailed in Macbeth, rates as a key figure in modern intellectual history and as one the most important British philosophers of the twentieth century.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Ross and Plato
  3. Ross and Aristotle
  4. Ross and Virtue Theory
  5. Ross and Kant
  6. Ross’s Ethical Theory: Main Components and Principles
    1. Ethical Non-naturalism
    2. Ethical Intuitionism
    3. Deontological Pluralism and Prima Facie Duties
  7. Ross’s Critique of Ideal Utilitarianism
  8. A Critical Assessment of Ross’s Theory
    1. Problems with Non-natural Properties
    2. Problems with Intuitionism
  9. Conclusion: Ross’s Status and Legacy
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Works Written, Edited, or Translated by W.D. Ross
    2. Other Relevant Books, Articles, and Resources

1. Biography

Sir William David Ross was born in Thurso, a small industrial, fishing, and tourist community in the county of Caithness on the northern coast of Scotland. He was the son of John Ross, an eminent teacher and school administrator. After spending the first six years of his life in India, where his father served as the first Principal of the Maharajah’s College at Travancore, Ross returned to Scotland and received his early education at the Royal High School in Edinburgh. He attended college at the University of Edinburgh and in 1895 graduated with first-class honors in classical studies. He continued his education at Balliol College, Oxford, graduating in 1898 with firsts in classics and humanities. In 1900 he was offered a lectureship at Oriel College, Oxford. In 1906 he married the former Edith Helen Ogden (d. 1953) with whom he had four daughters. Ross remained at Oxford for nearly fifty years, serving on the faculty and in various administrative positions, including Provost of Oriel College (from 1929 to 1947) and Vice-Chancellor of the University (from 1941 to 1944).

In the course of his distinguished academic career Ross achieved international recognition and acclaim for his contributions to ethical theory and classical studies. In addition to studies of Plato, Aristotle, and Kant, he also published two important and highly influential works of moral philosophy: The Right and the Good (1930) and Foundations of Ethics (1939). One of his foremost academic accomplishments was his editorship of the Oxford English translations of the complete works of Aristotle, a production of 11 volumes (1908-1931), to which he himself contributed well received and still widely used translations of the Metaphysics and the Nichomachean Ethics. In 1939 Ross served as President of the Aristotelian Society, the London-based organization founded in 1880 and dedicated to the promotion of philosophy as an intrinsically rewarding, life-enhancing communal enterprise.

In addition to his academic work, Ross also compiled a notable record of public service and civil administration. In 1915 he joined the British army and served in the Ministry of Munitions, rising to the rank of major and the position of Deputy Secretary. After the war he was awarded the OBE, and in 1938, in further recognition of his military accomplishments, he was officially knighted. From 1936-1940 he served as President of the British Academy, and in 1947 he was named president of the world’s oldest and largest academic federation, the Union Académique Internationale, an organization noted for its promotion of international cooperation in the pursuit of learning.

During and after WW II, Ross continued to serve in some type of public capacity or civic role, occupying a seat on an appeals panel for conscientious objectors and also serving as a member of Britain’s National Arbitration Tribunal (which set wage and price controls, arbitrated work stoppages, established anti-inflation policies, and settled economic conflicts and legal disputes during the war). After his retirement from academic and public life, Ross continued his lifelong study of philosophy. He died at Oxford on May 5, 1971.

2. Ross and Plato

In 1948, at the invitation of Queen’s University, Belfast, Ross delivered the annual Dill Memorial Lecture, named in honor of Sir Samuel Dill, a respected scholar and professor of Greek and Roman history. This lecture became the basis for an eventual book, Plato’s Theory of Ideas, which was originally published in 1951 and then later revised and corrected in a second edition of 1953.

Ross’s book is a formidable work of scholarship on Plato’s metaphysics and epistemology with special emphasis on the philosopher’s celebrated, historically important, and still highly controversial doctrine of Ideas. Ross’s method is that of classical philology, and his study follows in the footsteps of the previous work of James Alexander Stewart (1846-1933), his predecessor in the White’s chair of moral philosophy at Oxford. In essence, Ross provides close readings and commentaries on selected Platonic dialogues, with his main purpose being to show how each dialogue adds to, revises, or modifies Plato’s evolving theory.

Ross begins his inquiry by offering his best guess as to the probable chronology of Plato’s works, drawing not only on the consensus of scholarly opinion but also on the internal stylometric evidence of the dialogues themselves. (Stylistically and structurally, the earlier dialogues tend to be relatively simple and straightforward, the middle ones – especially the Cratylus and the Symposium – tend to be more playful, ironic, and experimental, and the later ones tend to be less fanciful and more controlled, though still relatively intricate and complex)

Ross contends that it is in the Euthryphro, a comparatively early work, that the word ἰδέα (literally something visible; something that can be seen) first appears in its “special Platonic sense” of an ideal Form or universal.  He goes on to argue that the theory of forms is more fully developed and explained in two relatively late dialogues, the Philebus and the Timaeus, and maintains that it is in two of the latest and most complex of Plato’s writings, the Laws and the Seventh Letter, that the doctrine is given its richest and most mature formulation.

According to Ross, the pivotal text in the development of Plato’s philosophy is the Parmenides, a middle to late text in which the title character and his colleague Zeno probe for defects and attempt to punch holes in the theory of universals as maintained by the young Socrates. Ross was one of the first scholarly commentators on Plato to interpret this dialogue not, as several previous critics had viewed it, as a mere whimsical parody or “philosophical jest,” but as a serious experiment in self-criticism on Plato’s part in which the philosopher takes the opportunity to cross-examine himself and evaluate the strengths and weaknesses of his own doctrine.  In effect, Ross sees Plato here articulating and attempting to come to grips with two major objections to his theory. The first is the so-called “third man” argument, which accuses the theory of leading to an infinite regress. (It is claimed, for example, that if a man is a man by virtue of his sharing or imitating the Form of Man, there must also be another Form of Man that both the man and the Form of Man share, and so on ad infinitum). Ross defends Plato’s theory against this argument and shows that it arises as a result of the slipperiness and ambiguity inherent in Plato’s own language (specifically, in the Greek verbs for “share,” “imitate,” and “participate.”)

The second criticism that Plato anticipates and tries to defend himself against (not entirely successfully in Ross’s view) is an objection that was later raised by Aristotle: namely, to affirm that the Ideas and their appearances are completely separate (that is, to claim that they indeed inhabit two entirely different realms with no interconnection or relationship of any kind), would seem to lead to a logical contradiction and philosophical absurdity. At some level, and to at least a minimal extent, Forms must stand in some type of relation with the particulars that exemplify them.

Ideal Redness, that is to say, has to share at least some definable relationship with apples, cherries, fire trucks, and other actual red things. Unfortunately, as Ross points out, Plato is seldom clear or consistent in describing the exact nature of this relationship. In the early dialogues, for instance, he seems to view the Ideas as immanent attributes or qualities (that is, as universal properties present within and manifested through sensible things). However, in the later writings he more often describes the Ideas as if they were transcendent paradigms; indeed he describes them (in the Phaedrus) as if they inhabited a pure realm or space of their own – a “hyper-uranian” or “supra-celestial” world entirely separate and independent from the world of material things and the objects of sense.

According to Ross, what makes this issue especially problematic is that even in the later dialogues Plato frequently reverts to the language of immanence. Ross speculates that this is probably because Plato himself never reached a definitive view of the matter and thus found it convenient to use the language of immanence in some cases (as, for example, when he suggests that a particular may exemplify or partake of a universal property) and the language of transcendence in others (as when he describes a particular as being an imperfect copy or imitation of a paradigmatic Form).

According to Ross, even though Plato is vague and inconsistent on the exact relationship of the Ideas to the objects of sense, he is clear and emphatic on two other important points:  (1) He maintains that there is at least one respect in which Ideas are essentially different from the sensible things that embody or imitate them: namely, the Ideas are eternal and immutable whereas the objects of sense are impermanent and subject to change. (2) He holds that Ideas aren’t merely subjective phenomena that exist only in the mind, but are instead ultimate realities and “completely objective.” In other words, they would exist even if there were no human minds to apprehend or perceive them.

In the end, Ross winds up in the camp of critics who view Plato as ultimately closer to the metaphysics and ontology of Aristotle (according to whom Ideas and particulars are deeply intertwined and practically inseparable) than to the view of Plotinus (who viewed the realm of being as a grand hierarchy, emanating from and ultimately surmounted and transcended by an indefinable, absolute, ideal reality, The One).

Surprisingly, Plato’s Theory of Ideas contains hardly any discussion at all of Platonic ethics. Indeed, despite Ross’s deep personal interest in and original contributions to moral theory, he never actually comments on any of the ethical concerns or lively moral disputes (for example, whether right and wrong are objective or subjective, whether all wrong-doing is due to ignorance on the part of the agent, whether virtue and goodness can be taught, and so on) that occupy Socrates in several of the Platonic dialogs.

Although Ross foregoes any direct commentary on these debates, he does make several references to Plato’s enigmatic Idea of the Good, the ultimate object of knowledge in Plato’s philosophy and the font and origin of all being and value in the Platonic system. This idea, most famously expressed via the simile of the Cave and the Sun (in the Republic, Book VII), appears to have exercised a considerable influence on Ross’s own philosophical thought (indeed, Ross’s notion that we grasp moral truths “intuitively,” as if via some type of innate knowledge or through an immediate, subliminal process of recognition and intellection is essentially Platonic in origin). In the end, it is therefore a bit disappointing not to find, if not a detailed examination of the Idea of the Good or of the intimations of moral intuitionism present in Platonic ethics, at least some acknowledgment on Ross’s part of his personal debt and kinship to his great Greek predecessor.

3. Ross and Aristotle

Even if he had never published The Right and the Good and become one of the leading figures of the analytic school and an important name in twentieth-century moral philosophy, Ross would still have gained lasting renown as a classics scholar. Indeed, during his lifetime, he earned as much acclaim for his accomplishments as the general editor of the 11-volume (eventually 12-volume) Oxford translation of the complete works of Aristotle as he did as for his innovative and provocative work in ethics.

The “Oxford,” as it is still popularly known, is a magisterial and historic literary achievement. At the time of its undertaking, there was but one extant English-language edition of Aristotle’s complete works, Thomas Taylor’s 10-volume translation of 1810. And since Taylor’s century-old edition had received only a limited printing, copies of it were scarce and nearly impossible to come by. Consequently, there was an urgent need for a new and authoritative set of translations in a format suitable and convenient not only for students and scholars but for non-academics and general readers as well. Along came Ross and his team of translators, a mix of veteran scholars and rising young talent specially selected to meet this exacting new challenge.

The project, spearheaded by Ross and his assistant editor J. A. Smith, took more than two decades. The first volume to be published (which became volume 8 in the completed series) was Ross’s own translation of the Metaphysics, which appeared in 1908. The final published volume (volume 3 of the completed edition) appeared in 1931. It contained translations of Meteorology, On the Soul (De Anima), the so-called Short Physical Treatises (Parva Naturalia), and On the Universe (De Mundo; a work that Ross himself dismissed as either spurious or of dubious authorship and which is now generally considered pseudepigraphical). In 1952 Ross added his own translation of various fragments of Aristotle. Although not part of the original project, this compilation was published as volume 12 of the Oxford series.

As general editor, Ross carefully reviewed existing English translations of Aristotle’s works and solicited and supervised the production of new ones from colleagues both within and outside the walls of Oxford. The final collection included an earlier (1885) translation of The Politics by the former Oxford vice-chancellor and renowned translator of Plato and Thucydides Benjamin Jowett. Jowett’s translation had already been hailed as “an English classic,” so Ross apparently judged that it was unnecessary and probably even futile to try to come up with a better one.  The complete edition of the Oxford also included the still unsurpassed translation of the History of Animals (Historia Animalium) by Ross’s fellow countryman (and later fellow peer) Sir D’Arcy Wentworth Thompson.

The Oxford bears many earmarks and virtues of Ross’s own style and editorial preferences: plain diction; lucidity; straightforward syntax; precise logical organization; a tone that is serious, but not grave or ponderous; and an utter absence of needless adornment, euphuism, and gaudy rhetoric. Moreover, since Ross himself seemed to model his own prose after that of the scientific and analytic Aristotle, rather than the more poetic and dramatic Plato, it is neither surprising nor coincidental that the Oxford translations faithfully reproduce many of the best qualities and typical attributes of Aristotle’s own expository style. These attributes include clarity, directness, orderly and systematic presentation, and a meticulous exactness and thoroughness. Aristotle and Ross even share some of the same vices:  both can be dry and over-technical at times and both (in time-honored professorial fashion) have a tendency to over-explain things.

Aristotle spiced his discourse with quotations and examples from the Homeric poems and indulged an occasional fondness for wordplay and neologisms (he invented the word “syllogism” along with terms like energeia – translated by Ross as “actuality” – and entelecheia – translated by Ross as “complete reality”). Ross favored examples and analogies from math and physics rather than imaginative literature – though he does light-heartedly quote Milton’s Satan at one point (“Evil, be thou my good,” R&G, 163). And despite his general preference for plain English, he was not averse to using an occasional jargon term or fancy Latinism (for example, “optimific” and “bonific”) as well as phrases of actual Latin, most notably his customized use of the tag prima facie (which, thanks to his usage, took on a new and specialized meaning in the field of deontological ethics).

Aristotle is highly metaphorical; Ross’s translations are not. The famous opening sentence of the Metaphysics provides a good example. Joe Sachs, perhaps the finest contemporary translator of Aristotle, renders it “All human beings by nature stretch themselves out toward knowing”(Metaphysics, Sachs, trans., 1). Ross translates it simply as “All men by nature desire to learn.” Sachs’ version is truly Aristotelian (capturing both the motion and effort in ὀρέγονται), but it is not exactly ordinary English. Ross’s translation is plain, spare, unadorned. It has the virtue of delivering the essence of Aristotle’s thought without drawing attention to itself – which is pretty much the case with the Oxford as a whole.

4. Ross and Virtue Theory

In 1923, while supervising the production of the Oxford, Ross published a general overview of the works of Aristotle. In the introduction to the 6th edition of the book, the philosopher J.L. Ackrill, an Oxford colleague of Ross’s,  aptly describes it as a “concise and comprehensive account of Aristotle’s philosophical works,” pointedly adding that “no better account exists”(Ross, Aristotle, vii)

Besides being a convenient introduction to its subject, Ross’s Aristotle also serves as an illuminating guide to the author’s own philosophical thought, especially in the field of ethics. For even though Ross never became a major proponent of virtue ethics per se, his theory of prima facie duties has much in common with and was clearly influenced by core elements and principles of Aristotelian moral philosophy. To begin with, Aristotle’s pronouncement near the beginning of the Nichomachean Ethics that ethics is not an exact science like mathematics, but instead deals with “things that are only for the most part true” (1094 b 20), is a view frequently echoed by Ross. Of course in acknowledging this, Ross is by no means approving or endorsing relativism. He is simply pointing out that moral judgments are often difficult, and that people can (and frequently do) disagree about what is right or wrong in a given case. (The mere fact of their disagreement doesn’t mean that right and wrong are relative any more than, say, the fact that jurors may disagree on a verdict in a criminal trial means that the guilt or innocence of the accused is relative)

A key phrase in The Right and the Good is taken directly from the Nichomachean Ethics: -- “the decision rests with perception” (Nichomachean Ethics, 1109 b 23, 1126 b 4; R&G, 42). In Aristotle this phrase is used in connection with the doctrine of the mean and refers to the fact that in many situations the exact mean (that is, the truly virtuous and appropriate action in a particular situation) may not be clear. In such doubtful instances the individual must rely on personal judgment to decide what is right. For example, suppose you observe a parent “correcting” a child in public. The behavior of the parent strikes you as lying somewhere in the twilight zone between extremely stern but still acceptable discipline and downright vicious and unacceptable verbal and physical abuse. What is your judgment of the situation, and how should you react? Should you say something to the parent? Should you intervene? According to Aristotle, “the decision rests with perception,” and if you are a person of good judgment and character, with a sense of what a truly virtuous person would do in the same situation, you’ll probably decide correctly and do the right thing.

In the case of Ross’s system of deontological pluralism and prima facie duties, “the decision rests with perception” refers to the resolution of ethical dilemmas, especially dilemmas that arise from the fact that rules of proper action and conduct may at times contradict each other. For example, my duty to tell the truth may conflict with my duty not to cause harm to another person. According to Ross, we typically resolve such dilemmas through an intuitive faculty and reasoning process similar to the personal judgment that Aristotle says we must employ when determining the truly virtuous action in a given case. Indeed, Ross even goes so far as to suggest that there is no moral decision or action that is not fraught with at least some element of conflict, however slight (R&G, 33-34). In many cases the conflict may seem relatively easy to resolve. For example, most of us would have little difficulty telling a lie if it saved innocent lives. Similarly, few of us would approve of enriching ourselves if it meant putting other people’s health at serious risk. On the other hand, many people find certain dilemmas (such as so-called “trolley problems” in which they must choose between causing the death of one person or permitting the death of several others) difficult and even stressful.

Another feature that Ross’s theory of prima facie duties shares in common with Aristotelian ethics is the respect that each theory gives to well established moral traditions and commonly held beliefs – the considered views, that is to say, of “the many and the wise.” At the beginning of the Nichomachean Ethics, Aristotle argues that a critical inquiry into moral values properly begins with and must take into account the “common opinions” (endoxa) of persons with broad life experience (1095 a 5) and of those who have been “brought up in good habits” (1095 b 5). His underlying assumption is that every reasonable and thoughtful adult will have at least a partial grasp of basic moral truths; and so wherever we find widespread agreement among a large number of such individuals, or among the most knowledgeable and experienced members of such a group, the more likely we are to discover moral perceptions and principles that are accurate and reliable (1098 b 27-29). Such commonly held principles and basic perceptions represent the appropriate starting point for any higher ethical inquiry or theoretical investigation:

We must . . . set the observed facts before us and, after first discussing the difficulties, go on to prove, if possible, the truth of all the common opinions about these affections of the mind, or, failing this, of the greater number and the most authoritative; for if we both refute the objections and leave the common opinions undisturbed, we shall have proved the case sufficiently. – Aristotle, Nichomachean Ethics, 1145 b 2-7 (emphasis added).

Ross’s theory rests on similar assumptions. Like Aristotle, Ross regards the common-sense moral opinions of “ordinary people,” and especially the views of “the many and the wise,” as a kind of ground zero or point of departure for moral theory. By ordinary people he means not just anyone or everyone, but only those who have reached a certain level of “mental maturity” and personal development (R&G, p. 12, 29). In addition, he looks upon principles and perceptions that have persisted for generations as having particular moral force and authority, and thus any theory that repeatedly contradicts those principles becomes immediately suspect. For example, if an ethical theory proved to be irreconcilably at odds with our “common-sense” or “everyday” conviction that we ought to keep promises, that fact in itself would be reasonable grounds for suspecting it of being erroneous or defective:

The existing body of moral convictions of the best people is the cumulative product of the moral reflection of many generations, which has developed an extremely delicate power of appreciation of moral distinctions; and this the theorist cannot afford to treat with anything other than the greatest respect. The verdicts of the moral consciousness of the best people are the foundation on which he must build; though he must first compare them with one another and eliminate any contradictions they may contain. (R&G, 41)

According to adherents of virtue theory, doing the right thing ultimately has less to do with defining and upholding basic ethical rules and duties than with molding good character and cultivating good habits of behavior. Ross, on the other hand, departs from virtue theory by insisting that there are certain fundamental rules or duties (such as our duty to keep promises or our duty to assist people in need) that are self-evident, duties that we know to be true and that we are obligated to uphold.

Despite the fact that Ross himself never fully subscribed to virtue ethics, he was nevertheless, through his scholarly work and through his leadership role in helping to make Oxford a magnetic center and focal point for Aristotle studies, highly instrumental in facilitating the rebirth and resurgence of Aristotelian ethics that began in England during the 1950’s. That resurgence effectively started with the ground-breaking work of Elizabeth Anscombe and continued during the latter half of the century with the contributions of Philippa Foot and Alasdair MacIntyre. Anscombe, Foot, and MacIntyre all had Oxford connections, and their achievement can thus be viewed as in some degree a continuation and extension of Ross’s philosophical legacy.

5. Ross and Kant

In 1954, well after the publication of his own important contributions to ethical theory (R&G and FofE), Ross produced a brief introduction and critique of Kantian ethics. Subtitled A Commentary on the Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten, Kant’s Ethical Theory is written from the point of view of a rival theorist and skeptical critic who is at the same time a scholarly student and admirer of the great German philosopher. The book remains one of the best and handiest short introductions to Kant’s moral philosophy.

After analyzing Kant’s concept of goodwill, Ross takes up his argument that a morally good action must not simply conform with the moral law, but must be performed in order to conform with the moral law; that is, the act must be performed in recognition of and out of respect for the moral law. Ross basically accepts this claim and agrees that it is not enough merely to do the right thing. For an act to be morally good, we must perform it because it is the right thing. For example, if I repay a loan simply to avoid a heavy fine or some form of legal penalty, I will have done the right thing but my action will have no genuine moral significance. Only if I repay the loan out of a sincere sense of personal obligation and a willing adherence to principle will my right action also be morally good. However, while conceding this important point, Ross takes issue with Kant’s further claim that only actions performed in conformity with a priori moral laws can be morally good. Why, Ross wonders, shouldn’t an action performed in accordance with a moral rule that we have formulated or adopted based on personal experience also be morally good? For example, suppose that based on his experience in armed service and through contact and interviews with other war veterans a soldier abandons his earlier belief that active participation in warfare is virtuous and honorable and instead comes to a new understanding (which now strikes him as self-evident and unassailably true) that engaging in war is wrong and that he has a moral obligation to oppose it. According to Ross, he would have the same duty to act in accordance with his newly formulated a posteriori moral conviction as he would an a priori moral principle. (Ross, by the way, had to deal with several cases of exactly this type in his role on a British panel reviewing applications for conscientious objector status during WW II. After the war, British law was modified to allow even veteran servicemen, based on their experience in combat, to redefine themselves as CO’s)

Over the course of his commentary, Ross repeatedly demonstrates his adroit critical powers and relentless skill in semantic and logical debate. Again and again he takes Kant to task for drawing some dubious distinction, or for using a term or phrase in some vague, questionable, or inconsistent way. “It is extremely hard to see what Kant’s meaning here is,” he wryly observes at one point (KET, 71). Elsewhere he chides Kant for his tendency to divide things into formal and material components, inevitably honoring the former and disparaging the latter, as if matter itself and the things of earth, as in the view of Christian neo-Platonism, were defective or corrupt. He even quibbles with Kant’s use of the phrase “categorical imperative” for his central principle, rightly pointing out that any unconditional rule or command is technically and by definition a categorical imperative, and so it is incorrect to speak of the categorical imperative as if there were only one.

Ross’s main objection to Kant’s system is its super-abstract, indeed virtually seraphic, and absolutist character.  He argues that Kant’s absolutism makes his theory impractical and contrary to plain thinking and common-sense morality and shows how the test of universalizability comes out differently if it is applied in very specific cases rather than in general, abstract ones.

The whole method of abstraction, if relied upon, when used alone, to answer the question ‘What ought I to do?’, is a mistake. For the acts we have to choose between, say the telling of the truth or the saying of what is untrue, in some particular circumstances, or the keeping or the breaking of a promise, are completely individual acts, and their rightness or their wrongness will spring from their whole nature, and no element in their nature can safely be abstracted from. To abstract is to shut our eyes to the detail of the moral situation and to deprive ourselves of the data for a true judgment about it. . . . The only safe way of applying Kant’s test of universalizability is to envisage the act in its whole concrete particularity, and then ask ‘Could I wish that everyone, when in exactly similar circumstances, should tell a lie exactly similar to that which I am thinking of telling?’ But then universalizability, as a short cut to knowing what is right, has failed us. For it is just as hard to see whether a similar act by someone else, with all its concrete particularity, would be right, as it is to see whether our own proposed act would be right (KET, 33-34).

However, Ross acknowledges that although the method of abstraction, “cannot safely be relied on as the sole method of judging right or wrong, it is a necessary part of the true method.” The true method, he goes on to show, is a process of minute and careful analysis and “successive abstraction,” and if at any level in the abstractive process “we come across a feature of the proposed act that is prima facie wrong, then Kant is right in holding that no gain to our own convenience will make the act right” (KET, 35). In the end, despite all his criticisms and reservations, Ross winds up with a ringing endorsement of both Kant the ethical theorist and Kant the man:

Kant’s doctrine has both theoretical and practical value in insisting ruthlessly on the need for sensitiveness to every questionable feature of a proposed act. It is his own moral sensitiveness, and his insistence on sensitiveness in others, that makes him, to my mind, the most truly moral of all moral philosophers. (KET, 35)

Advanced students of Kant will probably find relatively little in Kant’s Ethical Theory that they have not already learned or encountered elsewhere. But for beginning students it is hard to imagine a better introduction or starting point for deeper study. Ross’s handling of a wide assortment of thorny Kantian terms and concepts (objective desires vs. subjective desires; necessary duties vs. contingent duties; perfect duties vs. imperfect duties, and so forth) is deft and expert, and his explication and critique of the categorical imperative (in all three of its formulations) is acute and unsurpassed.

6. Ross’s Ethical Theory: Main Components and Principles

At the time of his death in 1971, Ross was as well known and as widely esteemed for his work as a classical scholar as for his contributions to moral philosophy. However, in the four decades since his death the general estimate of his achievement has altered, and while he is still revered for his accomplishments as a scholar and editor he is now more highly regarded for his vital and original contributions to ethical theory.

There are several reasons for this critical revaluation. First of all, there’s the simple fact that the illustrious “Oxford,” which at the time of its publication represented one of the truly landmark achievements in modern classical scholarship, has gradually become, with the passage of two generations, a largely forgotten historical relic, a collector’s item for bibliophiles. Second, during the same time period, classical philology and the scholarly study of Latin and Greek have become contracting disciplines and no longer form a central or growing part of the university curriculum. Meanwhile, the study of ethics has seen its role in higher education expand, and as a result ethical theory is now taught not just in philosophy departments in liberal arts colleges but in most business and professional schools as well. Not surprisingly, Ross’s reputation has followed this same general trend, with a continuing but only moderate appreciation for his work as a classicist and an increasing interest in his writings on ethics. Furthermore, it was not long after the original publication of The Right and the Good (1930) that ethical intuitionism, of which Ross was a leading advocate, fell into general disfavor among moral philosophers. The intuitionist approach, its critics argued, smacked of metaphysics and even theology, and the doctrine was roundly criticized and even ridiculed, especially by ethical naturalists and logical positivists. One exasperated reviewer dismissed it as a “strange” and “totally unilluminating” phenomenon (Warnock, 16). In the last twenty years, however, intuitionism has enjoyed a substantial rebirth and has gained new theoretical support and new adherents. This recent revival was in part spearheaded by a superb new edition of The Right and the Good (2002), freshly edited and introduced by Philip Stratton-Lake, and it was further strengthened by the publication of Robert Audi’s The Good in the Right, a strong re-statement of the intuitionist view.

What follows is a general exposition and critical assessment of Ross’s theory, its basic components, principles, foundations and implications, limitations and strengths.

Ross’s system of ethics, originally set forth in his classic work The Right and the Good (1930) and then revised and supplemented by a later, more methodical, more analytical presentation in Foundations of Ethics (1939), combines elements and insights from several earlier moral theories and philosophical traditions. As noted above, it has certain affinities and features in common with the thought of Plato (notably the Idea of the Good), Aristotle (such as the view that ethics is an inexact science and inevitably involves some degree of individual judgment), and Kant (for example, anti-consequentialism and the idea that good actions involve a sense of duty and a respect for moral law). Ross himself acknowledged as the most significant and immediate influences on his ethical ideas two of the leading figures in early twentieth-century British moral philosophy: H.A. Prichard and G.E. Moore.

Prichard’s provocative essay “Does Moral Philosophy Rest on a Mistake?” outlined several key insights (that ethical theory ought to accord with common-sense morality, that “goodness” and “rightness” and “desire” and “duty” are distinct and by no means equivalent terms, that the terms “end,” “motive,” and “purpose” are also problematic and need to be precisely defined, and so on) that influenced Ross’s thinking and eventually worked their way into his theory. And in Moore, Ross found both an important ally (both philosophers were proponents of non-naturalism) and perhaps his greatest opponent (The Right and the Good can be viewed as essentially a forceful critique and counter-theory to Moore’s ideal utilitarianism)

Ross’s ethical theory, commonly known as the theory of prima facie duties, is a deontological system with three key elements or basic principles: a. Ethical Non-naturalism. b. Ethical Intuitionism. c. Ethical Pluralism.

a. Ethical Non-naturalism

Non-naturalism refers to the meta-ethical view, originally propounded by Moore in Principia Ethica, that moral properties such as goodness are simple, non-natural properties of certain acts or objects and are neither equivalent to, reducible to, nor definable in terms of some other natural, empirical property (such as “pleasure”). According to Moore, any attempt to define “good” in terms of a natural property – for example, by making the statement “X is good” equivalent to the statement “X is pleasant” or “X is harmonious” or “X is highly evolved,” and so forth – is an instance of a category error that he termed the Naturalistic Fallacy.  In the case of Ross’s ethical theory, non-naturalism refers not only to this claim about the uniqueness and irreducibility of goodness and other moral properties but includes two other meta-ethical claims (characteristic of moral realism and cognitivism) as well. These are:

1. Moral statements are propositions and are either true or false independently of human opinion or belief.

2. Moral propositions are true when they accurately describe or correspond to an actual state of affairs (that is, when they reflect actual objective features of the real world) and are false when they do not.

In essence Ross claims that whenever we make a judgment such as “capital punishment is wrong” or “same sex marriages are bad” we are stating propositions that are either true or false. They are true if they correspond to actual, real-world states of affairs and false if they do not. Furthermore, since these statements purport to describe objective reality, they are essentially different from and cannot be reduced to statements that merely express personal emotions or describe states of mind. Contrary to emotivism and other forms of non-cognitivism and naturalism, the statement “Capital punishment is wrong” is not equivalent or reducible to statements like “I dislike capital punishment” or “Capital punishment is barbarous” or “Down with capital punishment.”

b. Ethical Intuitionism

Intuitionism is the epistemological view that some moral truths can be known without logical inference or systematic thought; such truths, it is argued, can be known directly either through a “moral sense” (the empiricist view) or by means of non-empirical a priori knowledge (the rationalist view). Ross’s intuitionism is in the rationalist, Common Sense tradition of figures like Thomas Reid, William Whewell, and Henry Sidgwick.

Kant was among the first to use the term “intuition” (Anschauung; literally, an act of “looking at” something) in a special sense to mean a form of cognition characterized by perceptual immediacy. It is a way of knowing an object by sensation and immediate perception rather than by an intervening process of reason, analysis, or logical consideration.

Going well beyond Kant, Henri Bergson later used the term “intuition” almost mystically to refer to a kind of holistic, in-depth act of cognition – a direct and immediate apprehension of the object in its totality rather than as a sum of partial perspectives or fragmentary views. An example here would be a direct and total immersion or thorough sensation of the city of Paris vs. a sense or knowledge of it put together from various maps, overlays, photographs, perspectives, histories, and so forth. According to Bergson, no matter how many incremental elements you add to the latter, you can never achieve the full and absolute knowledge provided by the former.

Ross’s use of the term “intuition” is different from and extends beyond the limited, non-inferential, perceptual ability described by Kant yet falls well short of the vast, clairvoyant, ultra-sensory power delineated by Bergson. His use was anticipated to some degree by William Whewell, who adapted the term to explain the operations of conscience and to describe the way that we come to know fundamental moral principles: “Certain moral principles being, as I have said, thus seen to be true by intuition, under due conditions of reflection and thought, are unfolded into their application by further reflection and thought” (Whewell, xx).

Michael Huemer, a modern-day rationalist intuitionist, uses intuition in a sense that seems close to the way that Ross uses and understands the term. “Reasoning” Huemer observes, “sometimes changes how things seem to us. But there is also a way things seem to us prior to reasoning; otherwise, reasoning could not get started. The way things seem prior to reasoning we may call an 'initial appearance'. An initial, intellectual appearance is an 'intuition'” (Huemer, 102).

Ross also uses the term to mean something like an “initial intellectual appearance,” but in his usage an intuition is a great deal more than just a mere presentiment or a kind of “seeming” since it typically results in a high level of conviction, indeed in the kind of confident knowledge conveyed by the phrase “moral certainty” in both its original Aristotelian and modern legal sense.

In short, “intuition” in Ross’s sense is simply the means by which we apprehend and know moral truths. It may begin as little more than an initial impression or “gut feeling,” a more or less instinctive reaction which may then be strengthened and approved by further consideration and reflection. And although it is essentially different from deduction or induction or any other purely rational, logical procedure or mathematical process, the moral knowledge that it provides can nevertheless strike us with something like the full force of recognition and sense of certainty of a mathematical demonstration.

Indeed, according to Ross, certain moral propositions, such as the claim that we should fulfill promises or that we should promote the good of others, strike us as “self-evident”:

. . . not in the sense that it is evident from the beginning of our lives, or as soon as we attend to the proposition for the first time, but in the sense that when we have reached sufficient mental maturity and have given sufficient attention to the proposition it is evident without any need of proof, or of evidence beyond itself. It is self-evident just as a mathematical axiom, or the validity of a form of inference, is evident. The moral order expressed in these propositions is just as much part of the fundamental nature of the universe (and, we may add, of any possible universe in which there were moral agents at all) as is the spatial or numerical structure expressed in axioms of geometry or arithmetic. In our confidence that these propositions are true, there is involved the same trust in our reason that is involved in our confidence in mathematics; and we should have no justification for trusting it in the latter sphere and distrusting it in the former. In both cases we are dealing with propositions that cannot be proved, but that just as certainly need no proof. (R&G, 29-30)

It is in this deep sense of the term that Ross and other rationalist intuitionists consider “intuition” to be a way of knowing equal or superior to discursive argument and dialectic and beyond mere casuistical disputation and logical debate. One is reminded of Dr. Johnson settling the issue of freedom of the will with abrupt finality: “Sir, we know our wills are free, and there’s an end on it!”

c. Deontological Pluralism and Prima Facie Duties

Ross’s ethical system is deontological and anti-consequentialist since it is based on adherence to rules or duties rather than outcomes. It is pluralist in the sense that, unlike Kantian ethics and utilitarianism (monist systems based on a single, pre-eminent, all-encompassing rule or principle – namely the categorical imperative and the principle of utility, respectively), Ross recognizes several different fundamental rules or principles that he terms prima facie duties. Moreover – and this is a key element and a distinctive feature of his theory – he acknowledges that these duties can, and invariably do, collide and come into conflict with one another.

The phrase prima facie, since it has the connotation of a mere initial appearance or first impression, is to a certain extent unfortunate and misleading. In fact Ross uses it somewhat apologetically. But he is careful to explain that a prima facie duty is by no means simply an apparent duty or an obligation that we might seem to have at first glance, but which later reflection or deeper analysis might very well invalidate. On the contrary, he stresses that a prima facie duty is entirely real and self-evident, though it is always contingent on circumstances and never absolute.

Ross initially identifies seven distinct prima facie duties:

1. Fidelity. We should strive to keep promises and be honest and truthful.

2. Reparation. We should make amends when we have wronged someone else.

3. Gratitude. We should be grateful to others when they perform actions that benefit us and we should try to return the favor.

4. Non-injury (or non-maleficence). We should refrain from harming others either physically or psychologically.

5. Beneficence. We should be kind to others and to try to improve their health, wisdom, security, happiness, and well-being.

6. Self-improvement. We should strive to improve our own health, wisdom, security, happiness, and well-being.

7. Justice. We should try to be fair and try to distribute benefits and burdens equably and evenly.

In Foundations of Ethics, Ross suggests that the duties of beneficence, self-improvement, and justice could be subsumed under a single duty to promote intrinsic values (that is, things that are intrinsically good). Doing this would reduce the number of prima facie duties from seven to five. However, the important thing here is not so much the exact number of duties that we recognize (Robert Audi lists ten) or the precise terminology that we use to identify or describe them, but to agree that the duties enumerated and described are all valid and certified. As Stratton-Lake points out, “Ross is not simply listing whatever moral obligations we think we have . . . . He is, rather, attempting to systematize as much as possible the moral convictions we have” (R&G, xxxvi).

Ross doesn’t try to establish a ranked hierarchy among his prima facie duties since he acknowledges that context and circumstances matter decisively and that individual cases must be judged accordingly. (For example, a promise to attend a beach party or golf outing doesn’t carry the same moral weight as a promise to attend a wedding or funeral) But he also observes that certain duties seem likely to take precedence over and tend to over-rule others. For example, most people would probably agree that our duty of non-maleficence trumps our duty to be beneficent and that in most cases it would be wrong to steal something from one person in order to give it to someone else. On the other hand, there are classic cases like that of Jean Valjean and the loaf of bread. Would you approve stealing from a wealthy aristocrat to feed a starving infant? Many people would. But they might also think there was something morally dubious about the action, or they might approve it in an abstract way but not feel wholly comfortable performing it themselves.

The claim that not only do we have multiple moral obligations (instead of a single imperative or rule – for example, “always treat yourself and others as an end and never solely as a means”) but that these various obligations can also come into conflict with one another constitutes a core insight and distinctive feature of Ross’s theory. For example, my decision to stop and assist an accident victim (duty of beneficence) might conflict with my promise to attend an important meeting (duty to fulfill promises) or run counter to my doctor’s recommendation that I avoid high-stress situations (duty of self-improvement). What is one to do in such cases? According to Ross, there will always be one duty that will have a greater urgency or priority than the others, and that will be the right thing to do, or as Ross terms it one’s duty proper, in a given case. Of course that doesn’t meant that we’ll always be able to identify with certainty exactly what that duty is. “The decision rests with perception.”

7. Ross’s Critique of Ideal Utilitarianism

In both The Right and the Good and in Foundations of Ethics, Ross offers his theory of prima facie duties as a major and in his view much-needed corrective to Kantian ethics and to the ideal utilitarianism of G.E. Moore. Ross’s critique of Kantian ethics, in essence a rejection of Kant’s monism and absolutism, has been dealt with above (see section 5 of this article). This section provides a brief overview of his critique of ideal utilitarianism.

Ideal utilitarianism, a form of consequentialism associated with Moore, can be defined as the view that right actions are those that in any given situation result in a maximum of overall good or (what amounts to the same thing) that produce the best possible outcome. Ross strongly opposes this view, although it should be pointed out that he doesn’t argue that ideal utilitarianism is completely wrong. He simply says that it is counter-intuitive (that is, contrary to common-sense ethics) and incomplete. In his view there are more duties and complications than are dreamt of in Moore’s philosophy.

In general, Ross has three main complaints against utilitarianism.

1. Ross claims that utilitarianism is simplistic and reductive. He argues that it overlooks or conflates the complicated ways in which human beings stand in relation, and thus in moral obligation, to one another:

[Utilitarianism] says, in effect, that the only morally significant relation in which my neighbors stand to me is that of being possible beneficiaries of my action. They do stand in this relation to me, and this relation is morally significant. But they may also stand to me in the relation of promisee to promiser, of creditor to debtor, of wife to husband, of child to parent, of friend to friend, of fellow countryman to fellow countryman, and the like; and each of these relationships is the foundation of a prima facie duty, which is more or less incumbent upon me according to the circumstances of the case. (R&G, 19)

2. Ross claims that utilitarianism is too general and abstract. He argues that it ignores or glosses over the “highly personal character” of moral relationships:

The essential defect of the “ideal utilitarian” theory is that it ignores, or at least does not do full justice to, the highly personal character of duty. If the only duty is to produce the maximum of good, the question of who is to have the good – whether it is myself, or my benefactor, or a person to whom I have made a promise to confer that good on him, or a mere fellow man to whom I stand in no such special relationship – should make no difference to my having a duty to produce that good. But we are all in fact sure that it makes a vast difference. (R&G, 22, emphasis added)

3.  Ross claims that the fundamental principle of utilitarianism – that an act is right if it produces the most overall good – is at odds with common sense morality. He uses a series of hypothetical examples to illustrate his point:

Suppose . . . that the fulfillment of a promise to A would produce 1000 units of good for him, but that by doing some other act I could produce 1001 units of good for B, to whom I have made no promise . . . . Should we really think it self-evident that it was our duty to do the second act and not the first? I think not.

. . . Or again, suppose that A is a very good and B a very bad man, should I then, even if I have made no promise, think it self-evidently right to produce 1001 units of good for B rather than 1000 for A? Surely not. (R&G, 35)

One further example presents a classic showdown between Ross’s ethics and Moore’s. Suppose B promises A that upon A’s death he will pass A’s entire fortune on to C.  However, it is evident that far more overall good will result from giving it to D. Should B give the estate to C or D? According to Moore and ideal utilitarianism, the answer is D. According to Ross, the answer is C.

Ross thinks this example is decisive and that it clearly illustrates the extent to which ideal utilitarianism contradicts our basic, common-sense morality. But does the example really do this? Wouldn’t our intuitive response to the dilemma depend a great deal, and perhaps decisively, on the specifics of the case and the actual identities of C and D? For example, what if C were a family pet and D were a charitable foundation with a spotless record of beneficence, efficiency, and goodwill? In that case, wouldn’t common-sense opinion judge that it is right for B to break his promise to A and to pass his estate on to D rather than C – in effect concluding that in this particular instance the duty to benefit others outweighs the duty to keep a promise?

The fact is, the apparently large theoretical distance between utilitarianism and Ross’s system of prima facie duties shrinks appreciably when the actual details of a given situation are filled in. And this is especially true if we compare later versions or modifications of each theory.  For example, the “two-level” preference utilitarianism of R.M. Hare has a Level-1 “intuitive” component that takes into account our immediate, common-sense judgments as well as a Level-2 “critical” component that makes more advanced judgments based on a deeper and fuller scrutiny of the facts in the case. Robert Audi’s deontological system also makes provision for both intuitive and inferential/critical thinking. Hare’s theory focuses on outcomes; Audi’s is based on intrinsic values and prima facie duties. But when it comes down to making practical judgments about right actions, the two theories aren’t all that far apart. “The decision rests with perception.”

8. A Critical Assessment of Ross’s Theory

“Metaphysics,” F.H. Bradley famously observed, “is the finding of bad reasons for what we believe on instinct” (Bradley, p. xiv). Error theorists, non-cognitivists, and other moral skeptics have said much the same thing about ethics, and especially about moral realism in all its forms.

Ross’s theory has been criticized by anti-realists and realists alike. And, not surprisingly, in most cases the main targets have been Ross’s intuitionism and non-naturalism, undoubtedly the most controversial features of his theory. Some of these criticisms are the result of confusion or misunderstanding and can be easily rebutted. But some are pointed and well-aimed and cannot be so easily dismissed.

a. Problems with Non-natural Properties

The whole concept of non-naturalism – that is, of properties (such as moral goodness) that are supposedly not subject to any form of empirical observation or detection and which, so it is claimed, cannot be reduced to, equated with, or defined in terms of some other natural property – has long been the object of skeptical criticism and occasionally even of ridicule. Such properties are often accused of being ineffable or other-worldly, indeed of being downright spooky, as if they defied comprehension and existed (if they exist at all) only in some timeless, trans-mundane or supra-celestial realm of their own, like the ideal Forms of Plato or the hidden, all-transcending God of the Gnostics. But as Philip Stratton-Lake has shown, it is a misconception or distortion of Ross’s theory to attribute to him anything like such a mystical or other-worldly view of moral properties (R&G, xxiii-xxiv).

What Ross actually claims is that some things in this world – namely certain human actions (such as sincere acts of honesty and beneficence) and certain pursuits like knowledge and pleasure – have intrinsic value and possess a property of being good or of being right. Of course he also admits there is no way for him to prove or authenticate that they have these qualities. Such a position (which is essentially no different from maintaining that moral judgments can be true or false even if we can never empirically confirm or disprove them) is indeed problematic, especially when viewed from the standpoint of naturalism or positivism. But it is nevertheless wrong to characterize Ross’s non-naturalism as in any way mystical or unearthly. Ross, after all, makes no appeal to an invisible moral order or to some type of supra-sensual reality to justify his view; on the contrary, he appeals directly to our ordinary, day-to-day experience – that is, to common-sense morality and the way things actually seem to us.

b. Problems with Intuitionism

In addition to being assailed for its non-naturalism, Ross’s theory has also been sharply criticized for its embrace of intuitionism. Moral intuitionism has been controversial in virtually all its forms, starting with the early 18th century “moral sense” theories of Lord Shaftsbury and Francis Hutcheson. However, these empiricist versions of intuitionism, which claim that we have a special moral faculty (indeed a kind of moral sense, analogous to our primary senses of sight, hearing, touch, taste, and smell) that enables us to directly perceive right and wrong, are essentially different from and in some ways at odds with the rationalist form of intuitionism upheld by Ross. Ross in fact denies that we directly “see” or perceive moral properties or moral truths. What he claims is that we have an intuitive (that is, non-inferential or proto- or meta-logical) ability to apprehend certain self-evident, fundamental moral facts – such as that lying and harming others are prima facie wrong. He says that we can then test and confirm these initial, intuitive impressions on the basis of further reflection or deeper consideration. Such a process is no more mysterious nor any more a matter of some type of uncanny, preternatural perception than the fact that we can instantly know the truth of a mathematical axiom. Intuition then, as Ross uses and understands the term, is an act of cognition, more or less immediate, whereby we apprehend prima facie duties. These duties then serve as a foundation or touchstone for further moral inquiry.

So much, then, for the accusation that Ross’s intuitionism is magical or strange. A more serious and wounding indictment of intuitionism comes from critics who are less bothered by its alleged mysteriousness than by the fact that it can be unreliable and lead to moral judgments that are highly questionable and possibly even false.  Peter Singer, for example, accuses intuitionists of forging normative ethical rules out of “moral intuitions” that are actually little more than biochemical reflexes, instinctive emotional responses that are in large part the product of our evolutionary past. (Singer, 338-9). Singer acknowledges that these “intuitions” are both very common and very compelling; and far from regarding them as being of mysterious or supernatural origin, he readily admits that they are entirely natural, intelligible, and real. Indeed, he regards their existence as to a large extent scientifically proven, since we can now actually “see” intuitive thinking at work using fMRI scans. Similarly, the compelling force and prevalence of many common moral intuitions can be neatly explained by evolutionary psychology.

But Singer questions whether intuitive judgments that can be traced to biologically-based instincts or semi-automatic emotional responses should be given special priority as a foundation for normative moral values – especially when research shows that such judgments are prone to error and are not easily overturned by further reflection. Intuitionists can respond by pointing out that regardless of their origin, and regardless of whether we call them intuitions, instincts, first impressions, or whatever, such judgments still provide the initial starting point for ethics and a vital platform for further inquiry. Ross, in particular, doesn’t claim that our moral intuitions and initial, common-sense judgments are infallible; instead, he acknowledges that they may benefit from and sometimes require deeper reflection and consideration. In this respect his intuitionism actually bears a slight resemblance to the “reflective equilibrium” of John Rawls (Rawls, 48). Of course Ross also admits, and indeed repeatedly emphasizes, that ethics is an approximate and inexact science which deals in probabilities, not certainties. In the final analysis, making accurate moral judgments is difficult since moral acts always “have certain characteristics that tend to make them at the same time prima facie right and prima facie wrong” and “there is probably no act . . . that does good to any one without doing harm to someone else, and vice-versa” (R&G, 33-34). The final decision, as is always the case with Ross’s theory, rests with perception.

9. Conclusion: Ross’s Status and Legacy

W. D. Ross is one of a select number of modern intellectuals who made important and lasting contributions to two different academic fields: in his case, ethics and classical letters. In the area of classical studies, his signal achievement was undoubtedly his editorship of the “Oxford,” the 11-volume English translation of Aristotle’s complete works that ignited a renewal of interest in the philosopher throughout the English-speaking world and to which he himself contributed elegant translations of the Metaphysics and the Nichomachean Ethics. One of the important secondary effects of this renewed interest in Aristotle was the re-discovery and eventual re-flourishing of virtue ethics during the second half of the 20th century. This powerful revival of virtue theory and eudaimonism would have been practically impossible if it had not been prepared and facilitated decades earlier by the appearance of the Oxford.

In the case of ethics, Ross occupies a well-deserved place in the long and distinguished line of British moral philosophers in the analytical-critical tradition, a group that includes such important names as Bentham, Mill, Sidgwick, Moore, Prichard, Hare, and Ayer. The Right and the Good (1930), his critique of ideal utilitarianism and exposition of this own deontological system, remains a classic text and a key document in the history of modern ethical theory, influencing later revisions or variations of intuitionism by Philip Stratton-Lake, Robert Audi, Michael Huemer, and others. C.D. Broad called the book “the most important contribution to ethical theory made in England in a generation” and applauded Ross for applying his considerable “good sense, acuteness, and clarity” to “elucidating questions of perennial significance” (Broad, 228).

10. References and Further Reading

a. Works Written, Edited, or Translated by W.D. Ross

  • Aristotle. Metaphysics. W.D. Ross, trans. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1908. Reprint. Stillwell, KS: Digiread, 2006.
  • Aristotle. Nichomachean Ethics. W.D. Ross, trans. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1925. Reprint: Stillwell, KS: Digiread, 2005.
  • Aristotle. Select Fragments. W.D. Ross, trans. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1952.
  • Ross, W.D. .Aristotle (1923). 6th ed., with an introduction by J.L. Ackrill. New York and London: Routledge, 1995.
  • Ross, W.D. The Right and the Good (1930). Philip Stratton-Lake, ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 2002.
  • Ross, W.D. Foundations of Ethics: the Gifford Lectures Delivered at the University of Aberdeen, 1935-6. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1939.
  • Ross,W.D. Plato’s Theory of Ideas. 2nd Edition. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1953.
  • Ross, W.D. Kant's Ethical Theory: A Commentary on the Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1954.

b. Other Relevant Books, Articles, and Resources

  • Anscombe, G.E.M. “Modern Moral Philosophy.” Philosophy, 33, 1958.
    • A key document in the modern revival of virtue ethics.
  • Aristotle. The Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation. Ed. Jonathan Barnes. 2 vols. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
    • A revised 2-volume version of the “Oxford.”
  • Aristotle. Metaphysics, Joe Sachs, trans. Santa Fe, NM: Green Lion Press, 2002.
    • Excellent modern translation with helpful introduction, glossary, and notes.
  • Audi, Robert. The Good in the Right: A Theory of Intuition and Intrinsic Value. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2005.
    • An important recent addition to and revision of traditional intuitionism.
  • Bradley, F. H. ”Preface” to Appearance and Reality. 2nd ed., rev. New York: McMillan and Co, 1908.
  • Broad, C.D. “Review of Foundations of Ethics by WD Ross.” Mind, 48, 1940. 228-239.
    • One renowned moral philosopher reviews and pays tribute to the work of another.
  • Ewing, A.C. The Definition of Good. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1947.
    • A meta-ethical work in the non-naturalist tradition of Moore and Ross.
  • Ewing, A.C. Second Thoughts in Moral Philosophy. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1959.
    • The author revises and partly rejects his earlier support for non-naturalism.
  • Foot, Philippa. Virtues and Vices. Oxford: Blackwell, 1978.
    • A strong case for a return to virtue ethics as a normative alternative to utilitarianism and deontology.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Idea of the Good in Platonic-Aristotelian Philosophy. P. Christopher Smith (trans). New Haven: Yale University Press, 1986.
    • Argues for an essential continuity in Platonic and Aristotelian thinking about the foundations of ethics and the nature of the good.
  • Hare, R. M. Moral Thinking: Its Levels, Method, and Point. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1981.
    • Finds a place for moral intuitions within utilitarian theory.
  • Huemer, Michael. Ethical Intuitionism. New York and London: Palgrave Macmillan, 2005.
    • A theoretical exposition and defense of intuitionism.
  • Kahneman, Daniel. Thinking, Fast and Slow (New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux, 2011).
    • A detailed analysis and demonstration of the pervasiveness as well as the strengths, limitations, and occasional perils of intuitive thinking by the famed psychologist and Nobel prize winner.
  • MacIntyre, Alistair. After Virtue. London: Duckworth, 1985.
    • Makes a case for the rejection of modern moral philosophy and a return to Aristotelian ethics.
  • Moore, G.E. Principia Ethica. 1903. Rev. ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
    • One of the seminal documents in modern moral philosophy, setting forth the basis and rationale for non-naturalism and ideal utilitarianism.
  • Prichard, H.A. “Does Moral Philosophy Rest on a Mistake?” Mind. Vol. 21, 21-37, 1912.
    • A classic essay in favor of intuitionism and an important influence on Ross’s thinking.
  • Rawls, John. A Theory of Justice. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1971.
    • One of the great works of modern moral, social, and political thought. Introduced the phrase “reflective equilibrium” as an account of how we reach an ultimate balance or harmony among competing beliefs or moral judgments.
  • Singer, Peter. “Ethics and Intuitions.” Journal of Ethics. Vol. 9. No. 3 and 4. 2005, 331-352.
    • A critique of intuitionism on grounds that “moral intuitions” are essentially biologically driven emotional responses and are prone to error.
  • Stewart, John Alexander. Notes on the Nichomachean Ethics of Aristotle. 2 vols. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1892.
    • An early work in the Oxford tradition by Ross’s mentor and predecessor in the Whyte’s chair of moral philosophy.
  • Stewart, John Alexander. Plato’s Doctrine of Ideas. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1909.
    • A forerunner and model for Ross’s later study on the same topic.
  • Stratton-Lake, Philip. Ethical Intuitionism: Re-evaluations. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2002.
    • A review and assessment of intuitionism by the editor of  Ross’s The Right and the Good.
  • Taylor, Thomas. The Rhetoric, Poetics, and Nichomachean Ethics of Aristotle. 2 vols. London, 1818.
    • A classic selection from the original English translations of Aristotle’s complete works.
  • Warnock, C.J. Contemporary Moral Philosophy. London: MacMillan, 1967.
    • A survey of modern theories, including a dismissive account of intuitionism.
  • Whewell, William. The Elements of Morality, Including Polity. Vol. 1. Revised edition. London: John Parker, 1848.
    • An important early document in the development of rationalist intuitionism.


Author Information

David L. Simpson
DePaul University
U. S. A.