Hans-Georg Gadamer (1900-2002)

GadamerHans-Georg Gadamer was a leading Continental philosopher of the twentieth century. His importance lies in his development of hermeneutic philosophy. Hermeneutics, “the art of interpretation,” originated in biblical and legal fields and was later extended to all texts. Martin Heidegger, Gadamer’s teacher, completed the universalizing of the scope of hermeneutics by extending it beyond texts to all forms of human understanding. Hence philosophical hermeneutics inquires into the meaning and significance of understanding for human existence in general.

Gadamer was influenced by Heidegger’s interest in the “question of Being,” which aimed to draw our attention to the ubiquitous and ineffable nature of Being that underlies human existence. “Being” refers to something like a “ground” (although not in the modern sense of “foundation”) or, better, background, that precedes, conditions, and makes possible the particular forms of human knowing as found in science and the social sciences. Gadamer developed Heidegger’s commitment to the ubiquitous and fundamental nature of Being in three related ways.

First, Gadamer wanted to elucidate the historical and linguistic situatedness of human knowing and to emphasize the necessity and productivity of tradition and language for human thought. For example, when Gadamer wrote that “Being that could be understood is language,” he meant that Being underlies, exceeds, and makes possible language.

Second, Gadamer sought to contend against the hubris of twentieth century positivism by demonstrating that truth is not reducible to a set of criteria, as is suggested by promoters of there being a scientific method. Just as Heidegger set out to uncover the way in which Being makes beings possible, so Gadamer aimed to demonstrate that truths derivable from method require a deeper, more extensive Truth. In order to extend truth’s domain beyond that of method (and note that Gadamer was never against method or science—only their totalizing tendencies), Gadamer explicates truth as an event. Truth is not, fundamentally, what can be affirmed relative to a set of criteria but an event or experience in which we find ourselves engaged and changed. These first two points form the emphasis of his magnum opus, Truth and Method (Wahrheit und Methode).

A third way of understanding Gadamer’s defense of the ubiquity of Being can be seen in the practical trajectory of Gadamer’s hermeneutics that arises from his interest in Plato and Aristotle. From Plato, Gadamer discerns the centrality of dialogue as the means by which we come to understanding. Dialogue is rooted in and committed to furthering our common bond with one another to the extent that it affirms the finite nature of our human knowing and invites us to remain open to one another. It is our openness to dialogue with others that Gadamer sees as the basis for a deeper solidarity. With Aristotle, Gadamer affirms the commitment that all philosophy starts from praxis (human practice) and that hermeneutics is essentially practical philosophy. We must not allow knowing to remain only on the conceptual (that is, distanced and theoretical) level; we must remember that knowing emerges from our practical quest for meaning and significance. Gadamer’s hermeneutics elucidates how Being makes human existence meaningful, where Being refers to commonality we all share.

Gadamer’s many essays and talks on ethics, art, poetry, science, medicine, and friendship, as well as references to his work by thinkers in these fields, attest to the ubiquity and practical relevance of hermeneutic thought today.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
    1. Early Years: Platonic Urges
    2. Middle Years: Under the Influence of Heidegger
    3. Later Years: Truth and Method and Beyond.
  2. Hermeneutic Inceptions
    1. Plato
    2. Aristotle
  3. “Foundations” of Philosophical Hermeneutics: Truth and Method
    1. Truth Beyond Science
    2. Prejudice, Tradition, Authority, Horizon
    3. Dialectic, Dialogue, Language
  4. Critical Encounters
    1. E.D. Hirsch
    2. Jürgen Habermas
    3. Jacques Derrida
  5. Practical Philosophy: Hermeneutics Beyond Gadamer
    1. Hermeneutics as Dialogue: Ethical and Political Interventions
    2. Twentieth Century Anglo-American Appropriations
    3. Applied Hermeneutics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Collected Works in German
    2. Main Books by Gadamer in English
    3. Selected Secondary Literature

1. Biography

a. Early Years: Platonic Urges

Hans-Georg Gadamer was born on February 11, 1900 in Marburg, Germany. Two years later his family moved to Breslau where his father took up the position of professor of pharmacological chemistry. The presence of his domineering, strict Prussian father devoted to natural science, and the absence of his deeply pietistic mother (who died in 1904 from diabetes) perhaps contributed to Gadamer’s interest in poetry and the arts. In his words, poetry and the arts were the closest things an “unredeemed agnostic” had to contend with the limits of human knowing (Gadamer: A Biography, 20-23).

In 1918 Gadamer began his studies at Breslau and then moved to the University of Marburg, where his father received a teaching position and later became rector. At Marburg, Gadamer first studied with Richard Hönigswald, who introduced him to neo-Kantianism, and then with Nicolai Hartmann, whose brand of phenomenology presented challenges to the neo-Kantianism of Hönigswald. Hartmann’s critique of neo-Kantianism proved a crucial impetus for Gadamer’s own thinking, including his subsequent turn away from neo-Kantianism. Yet Gadamer eventually came to question Hartmann’s rigid epistemology due to the fact that it remained committed both to Aristotelian realism and to an impoverished form of phenomenology, which failed to take seriously the importance of the knower’s perspective. Gadamer accused Hartmann’s phenomenology of not being radical enough since it ignored the more fundamental conditions of human knowing.

In 1922 Gadamer wrote his (unpublished) thesis with Paul Natorp on “The Nature of Pleasure according to Plato’s dialogues” (despite Natorp’s initial suggestion to write on Fichte). Natorp, himself a prominent Plato scholar and neo-Kantian at the time, took over in the wake of the declining influence of the neo-Kantians at Marburg. In Gadamer’s thesis we find the seeds of his later writings on Plato and Aristotle, gleaned from Natorp, that emphasized the unity of the one and the many, the forms, and the realm of sensuality. Gadamer was not only influenced by the mysticism of Natorp but also by the esotericism of the poet Stefan George, of whose circle he was a member. While a definitive causality is impossible to prove, one can detect connections between the recurrent challenge to scientism that pervades Gadamer's later, explicitly hermeneutic philosophy and the various “mysticisms” of Plato, Natorp, George, and Heidegger. What can be defended, however, is that what united the “mysticisms” of these thinkers, and thus inspired Gadamer, was their gesturing towards the realm beyond being that exposes the limitations of human understanding. While some used their “mysticism” to avoid the prosaic cares of daily life—cares that only blocked our access to this loftier, more radical and thus worthier realm—Gadamer rejected such an escapism and instead extolled “mysticism” for its propensity to insist on the finitude of human existence. True to his own unique interpretation of Plato that sought to refuse simplistic dualisms, Gadamer advocated acknowledging the beyond while at the same time insisting on our practical existence. In other words, human thinking always requires an acknowledgment of what cannot be fully captured in language, yet at the same time language, as that part of Being that can be understood, functions to create our human world and funds meaning. These themes of the productivity of the liminal or “horizonal”(for example, as developed by his notion “fusion of horizons”), and language’s in-between status, were born out of his early “Platonism” and served to undergird his later hermeneutic philosophy.

b. Middle Years: Under the Influence of Heidegger

Gadamer first encountered the written work of Heidegger in 1921 after reading one of Heidegger’s papers on Aristotle. Heidegger’s Aristotelian phenomenology, which refused the reductionism of Husserl’s phenomenology, provided Gadamer with the tools and impetus to deal the final blow to his earlier tendencies toward neo-Kantianism. During the summer of 1923 he pursued studies with Heidegger in Freiburg, where he also attended classes of Edmund Husserl, who although Heidegger’s teacher, stood in his shadow. When Heidegger was offered a position as chair at Marburg in October 1923, Gadamer followed him, a move that exacerbated the tension between Heidegger and Hartmann since many of Hartmann’s students ended up leaving him to study with Heidegger. Fellow students at Marburg during that period included Hannah Arendt, Hans Jonas, Jakob Klein, Karl Löwith, and Leo Strauss. Gadamer’s work with Heidegger was initially delayed due to Gadamer’s contraction of polio in 1922, which later served to exclude him from military service. It was during Gadamer’s convalescence that Hartmann worked to arrange a marriage for Gadamer to Frida Katz in 1923, with whom he had a daughter, Jutta, in 1926.

It should be noted that Gadamer’s relationship with Heidegger was an ambivalent one. Early on, Gadamer had thought he would write his Habilitation (doctoral dissertation) with Hartmann, but then he set his sights on Heidegger. However, Heidegger was initially unimpressed by Gadamer’s philosophical potential and encouraged him to pursue philology instead. Gadamer followed his advice and spent a number of years studying Plato with Paul Friedländer, from whom he learned about Plato’s dialogic and dialectic philosophy, an emphasis that would prove central to Gadamer’s later hermeneutics. In 1928, upon hearing of Gadamer’s plan to write his Habilitation with Friedländer, Heidegger reversed his earlier view of Gadamer’s incompetence as a philosopher and wrote a letter inviting Gadamer to work with him. In 1929 Gadamer took up a teaching position at Marburg and completed his Habilitation with Heidegger, published in 1931 as Plato’s Dialectical Ethics.

In 1933, while teaching courses on ethics and aesthetics at Marburg, Gadamer signed a declaration in support of Hitler and his National Socialist regime. Did this mean that like his teacher, Heidegger, he was an unabashed supporter of National Socialism? If so, as some suggest (Orozco), why would Gadamer have expressed shock months earlier when Heidegger had announced his own support for National Socialism? And why did Gadamer intentionally cultivate and maintain friendships with Jews during those years, while distancing himself from Heidegger until after the war? Gadamer’s biographer, Jean Grondin, offers details of Gadamer’s actions and inactions during this vexed period, and concludes that while Gadamer may have lacked the political savvy and courage for resistance, he was, unlike Heidegger, no Nazi. Reflecting back in later years Gadamer describes his shortsightedness: “it was a widespread conviction in intellectual circles that Hitler in coming to power would deconstruct the nonsense he had used to drum up the movement, and we counted the anti-Semitism as part of this nonsense. We were to learn differently” (Gadamer: A Biography, 75).

c. Later Years: Truth and Method and Beyond.

In 1939 Gadamer became a professor at Leipzig, where his first course was “Art and History,” which, as Grondin maintains, paved the way for his magnum opus, Truth and Method, published in 1960. In the same year, his first festschrift, which includes an essay by Heidegger, was also published. At Leipzig, Gadamer served as dean of the Philology and History Department and the Philosophy Faculty, as well as director of the Psychology Institute and in 1946 became rector. Unhappy due to political criticism launched at him, he sought a position in the west and initially taught at Frankfurt (1948) before accepting Karl Jasper’s offer to chair the philosophy department at Heidelberg (1949), where he taught until his official “retirement” in 1968. In 1950 he married again, this time to his former student and member of the resistance, Käte Lekebusch, with whom he had a daughter, Andrea, in 1956.

It was not until after his retirement that he gained status as an international thinker and a philosopher in his own right. This influence was due to several reasons. First, important debates with Jürgen Habermas and Jacques Derrida served to distinguish philosophical hermeneutics as a serious contender against both the critique of ideology and deconstruction. Second, he spent nearly twenty years teaching and lecturing in the United States each fall semester. Finally, Truth and Method was published in English in 1975. He continued to teach and lecture internationally and in Germany into his one-hundredth year. Gadamer died on March 13, 2002 in Heidelberg, while recovering from heart surgery. Today he is recognized as the preeminent voice for philosophical hermeneutics. Four claims focus the significance and originality of his hermeneutics: 1) hermeneutic philosophy is fundamentally practical philosophy, 2) truth is not reducible to scientific method, 3) all knowing is historically situated, and 4) all understanding reflects the ubiquity of language.

2. Hermeneutic Inceptions

a. Plato

Gadamer acknowledged that Plato, far more than Hegel or any other German thinker, motivated and inspired all his hermeneutics. Gadamer, though, remains no “traditional” Platonist, for, his early work on the Ancient Greeks is devoted to an attentive and nuanced re-reading of the significance of Plato for us today. What distinguishes Gadamer’s work on Plato is his desire to understand the questions and problems that motivated Plato. This approach stands opposed to attempts, common in Ancient Greek scholarship of the early twentieth century (for example, Leo Strauss and his followers), to uncover the “hidden doctrine” of Plato. In attempting to answer why Plato wrote his dialogues and what he was arguing against, Gadamer incites us not just to put questions to Plato—which can lead to an excessively distanced criticism of Plato—but to allow Plato to question us. The radical return to Plato made Gadamer all the more receptive to and excited by the thinking of Heidegger who also sought to understand Aristotle anew and in a more radical way.

As a result of his unique approach, Gadamer’s interpretation of Plato avoids the standard dualism (entrenched in part, Gadamer tells us, by Aristotle’s literalist readings of his teacher) that pits the Good-Beyond-Being against the good-for-us. Gadamer emphasizes the productive, rather than problematic, nature of the chorismos (the separation) between the sensual world of appearances and the transcendent realm of the forms. In other words, pace Aristotle, this separation was necessary and productive and not something to be overcome. Gadamer follows Plato in insisting on the ontological nature of the Good. Far from an empty concept, as Aristotle charged, the Good serves as an assumption that makes possible all understanding. The Good symbolizes the way in which thinking always “points beyond itself” (Philosophical Apprenticeships, 186). The plethora and variety of appearances must be made sense of in light of the assumption that something lies beyond our present understanding—namely, the Idea of the Good. Plato appealed to the Good in order to criticize the ethical relativism of the Eleatics. Gadamer draws our attention to how Plato’s appeal to the Good allowed him to transform Eleatic dialectic in two important ways: 1) to direct it towards getting clear about the “subject matter” (die Sache) as opposed to having as its goal the defeat of one’s opponent with logical prowess, and 2) to ground it in Socratic dialogue. Gadamer himself sought to recover the emphasis on the early Platonic dialectic, while refusing its later Hegelian instantiation, in order to return philosophy to Plato’s original intention as a dialectic defined primarily as the “art of carrying on a conversation” (Philosophical Apprenticeships, 186). The key to Gadamer’s later hermeneutics is grasping the significance of how Gadamer understands the connection between Platonic dialectic and Socratic dialogue.

b. Aristotle

Gadamer also returns anew to Aristotle. By stressing the import of Aristotle’s practical philosophy as that which emphasizes the background, that is, the conditions, for knowing, Gadamer challenged one of the leading Aristotelians of his day, Werner Jaeger. All knowing always starts from practical human concerns and must not lose its way in abstraction (a charge Gadamer later made against the Critique of Ideology). Gadamer’s interest in practical philosophy and its basis in human experience motivated hermeneutics’ ethical sensibilities, for instance, as witnessed in Gadamer’s esteem of phronesis as a key hermeneutic principle. What Gadamer wants to draw out from phronesis is the way in which knowledge is for the sake of acting, in other words, for the sake of living. An excessively theoretical or scientific knowledge forgets that knowledge stems out of and must return to praxis. But what sort of knowledge is sufficient for action conditioned by the variability of human life? The knowledge appropriate for the task is what Aristotle names as “phronesis.” Such a knowledge requires application but not in the way that modern science understands application: namely, the secondary and discrete step that follows from a prior theoretical knowledge. Neither is it adequately expressed by “judgment” (as in its later Kantian instanciation that subsumes a particular under a universal.) that subsumes a particular under a universal. Phronesis rejects the theory-practice dualism of both of these models of knowledge and instead entails the ability to transform a prior communal knowledge, that is, sensus communis, into a know-how relevant for a new situation. It is this requirement for human judgment emerging forth from a specific human community that Gadamer describes as reflective of hermeneutic understanding. The ethical overtone of phronesis as a hermeneutic concept suggests the way in which this knowledge is directed toward right action based on a “universal” (that is, communal rather than transcendent) knowledge. As Gadamer explains in Truth and Method, while “hermeneutical consciousness is involved neither with technical nor moral knowledge” (315) there is an overlap with the latter to the extent to which it entails right action based primarily on the ability to make one’s own that which comes to one out of a community. Such knowledge emerges out from and returns to praxis. Accordingly, one of Gadamer’s key contributions to philosophy, and one that took him beyond his teacher, Heidegger, was to insist that hermeneutics is practical philosophy. Gadamer clarifies that practical philosophy is rooted in human existence, which is never solipsistic but always communal. Rejecting the absolutism of modernity, Gadamer’s philosophy emphasized experience, but not the isolated existence of much 19th and 20th century existentialism. Rather, for Gadamer, existence means existing with others, which requires dialogue born of humility and an openness for inquiry: “hermeneutic philosophy understands itself not as an absolute position but as a way of experience. It insists that there is no higher principle than holding oneself open in a conversation” (Philosophical Hermeneutics, 189).

3. “Foundations” of Philosophical Hermeneutics: Truth and Method

a. Truth Beyond Science

Heidegger referred to his own early work as “hermeneutical philosophy,” and after his “turn” quipped that he wanted to leave the business of hermeneutics to Gadamer. Gadamer himself was never sure whether this was a compliment or a criticism! Nonetheless, Gadamer did develop hermeneutics beyond Heidegger’s use of that term, which can be seen foremost in Gadamer’s unique concept of truth, as developed most fully in Truth and Method.

Originally titled by Gadamer as Foundations of a Philosophical Hermeneutics, Truth and Method is just that. Following Heidegger’s initiative to increase the scope of hermeneutics beyond that of texts, Gadamer endorses the insight that humans are fundamentally beings who are given to understanding. Our task, if we are to truly know ourselves, is to figure out what such understanding entails, taking into account both its possibilities and limitations. Gadamer, however, goes further than Heidegger and asks if this is the case, what specifically does this mean for the humanities (Geisteswissenschaften)? Gadamer’s answer has both negative and positive components. Negatively, Truth and Method is critical of not only the methodologism and scientism underlying the hermeneutics of Dilthey and the phenomenology of Husserl, but also the twentieth century proclivity for positivism and/or naturalism. Yet in his move to put science “in its place,” so to speak, one finds a positive attempt to reinvigorate our appreciation of art, showing not only how it speaks truth but also how it serves as the paragon of truth. He argues not only that meaningful knowledge sought by the humanities is irreducible to that of the natural sciences, but that there is deeper, richer truth that exceeds scientific method. However, this commitment does not mean, as Jürgen Habermas and Paul Ricoeur maintained, that Gadamer opposes truth to method. For such a conclusion misses the crucial point that for Gadamer all forms of methodological truth are dependent on this deeper sense of hermeneutic truth. What sort of truth is it that underlies yet is not limited to natural scientific truth?

Over and against traditional conceptions of truth, Gadamer argues that truth is fundamentally an event, a happening, in which one encounters something that is larger than and beyond oneself. Truth is not the result of the application of a set of criteria requiring the subject’s distanced judgment of adequacy or inadequacy.  Truth exceeds the criteria-based judgment of the individual (although we could say it makes possible such a judgment). Gadamer explains in the last lines of Truth and Method that “In understanding we are drawn into an event of truth and arrive, as it were, too late, if we want to know what we are supposed to believe” (490). Truth is not, fundamentally, the result of an objective epistemic relation to the world (as put forth by correspondence or coherence theories of truth). An objective model of truth assumes that we can set ourselves at a distant from and thus make a judgment about truth using a set of criteria that is fully discernible, separable, and manipulable by us. Gadamer’s point is that there is a more fundamental happening of truth that is irreducible to such methodological applications, which perhaps we could call verisimilitudinous in regards to the deeper, hermeneutic, sense. Gadamer aims not to negate scientific method but to elucidate 1) what makes it possible and 2) the limitations of its scope. Gadamer is interested in dispelling the hubris of science (that is, scientism born of positivism) and not denigrating the practice of science per se. Furthermore, Gadamer took pains to clarify in his foreword to the second edition of Truth and Method that he is not offering a new method for hermeneutics or the social sciences. His work is not prescriptive. But neither is it descriptive of human behavior. He tells us: “My real concern was and is philosophic: not what we do or what we ought to do, but what happens to us over and above our wanting and doing” (xxviii). This statement also reveals the influence that Heidegger’s retrieval of the question of Being had on Gadamer’s thought in general, and his account of truth in particular. Gadamer’s critique of a scientific or modern theory of truth was, like much of Heidegger’s thought, a critique of subjectivism. Specifically, Gadamer maintained that the knower is never able to fully conceptualize and judge his or her own belief structure. Yet Gadamer’s account of truth went further than Heidegger’s and entailed a second claim, namely, that truth is fundamentally practical. Let us take a closer look at each of these two claims.

Regarding his anti-subjectivism, Gadamer describes the event of truth as an experience in which one is drawn away from oneself into something beyond oneself. To experience truth requires losing oneself in something greater and more extensive than oneself. The paradigmatic example of such an anti-subjective experience is play, to which Gadamer devotes quite a bit of space in Truth and Method. In order to appreciate the anti-subjective emphasis of play, it is helpful to understand its “medial” (Truth and Method, 103, 105) nature: players do not direct or control the play but are caught up in it. Play has “primacy over the consciousness of the player” (104), follows its own course, and plays itself, so to speak. Play is not played by a subject but rather absorbs the player into itself. Gadamer’s primary concern is to elucidate what it means to be caught up in the game in a way that diminishes the subjectivity of the player. In fact, the subject of the game is not the player but the game itself. However, this emphasis does not mean that the player relinquishes all power or consciousness and dons a zombie-like state—in which case there would be no mediality. Rather, Gadamer’s point is that play is effortless, without strain, and spontaneous (105), always enticing one into more play. The fact that in play one experiences oneself as in-between oneself and the play, that is, one neither exerts full control nor is passively swept along, reflects its mediality.

The constant back-and-forth movement of play eludes the grasp and guidance of an agent’s will, and yet, at the same time, is seemingly full of initiative. Play succeeds when the player engages in it with ease and where the player is never awkward or removed. But neither is the play excessively competitive. Gadamer’s insistence on the “contested” nature of such movement emphasizes the fact that one always plays with something or someone else. By “contest” Gadamer means to suggest only that play is never the act of a lone individual—not that it is necessarily agonistic. The negative component of competition that some (Lugones) read into Gadamer is difficult to defend given Gadamer’s insistence that the goal of play is not to end the game by winning but to keep on playing. While there is an initial assertive and intentional choice of entering into a game, once the game has gotten underway, being caught up in the game replaces any prior intentionality. To play, as Gadamer suggests, is to choose to give up our choice. In play, one substitutes one’s “free, individual choice,” so to speak, for the experience of a new sort of freedom which entails losing oneself in reciprocal play with someone or something else. The alleged “freedom” to remain isolated, in control, and able to choose is replaced by the freedom found in relinquishing oneself to the play of the game.

In addition to its medial nature, Gadamer highlights a second feature of play, namely “presentation,” which is what ultimately allows Gadamer to explain how play becomes transformed into art. Gadamer insists that human play is always marked by self-presentation: in play we present ourselves as something/someone else. While there is self-presentation in nature, according to Gadamer, human play-as-self-presentation is different:

The self-presentation of human play depends on the player’s conduct being tied to the make-believe goals of the game, but the “meaning” of these does not in fact depend on their being achieved. Rather, in spending oneself on the task of the game, one is in fact playing oneself out. The self-presentation of the game involves the player’s achieving, as it were, his own self-presentation by playing—that is, presenting—something. Only because play is always presentation is human play able to make representation itself the task of the game. (Truth and Method, 108)

What Gadamer is getting at here is that the purpose of play is not a presentation of a final, completed product for a third-party observer. Rather, he clarifies how in play our only goal is to figure out how to represent ourselves so that the game continues, thus recalling the contestial nature of play that requires two and aspires to keep playing. In other words, in true play the goal is not to achieve the prize but to present oneself as something in such a way that furthers the play.

Gadamer describes how play becomes “art” when the presentation is aimed at the absence of the “fourth wall”—that is, the viewer. Whereas in games the presentation is self-contained, in art, play-as-presentation does aim at something beyond itself. The playful self-presentation characterizing mediality gets transformed into pure presentation in art, signifying a potential for truth not found in the anti-subjective dimension of play. However, Gadamer warns, “when we speak of play in reference to the experience of art, this means neither the orientation nor even the state of mind of the creator or of those enjoying the work of art, nor the freedom of subjectivity engaged in play, but the mode of being of the work of art itself” (Truth and Method, 101). To grasp exactly what Gadamer means by “the mode of being of the work of art itself” we can now attend to the second claim Gadamer raises about truth, namely, its practical importance. Art exemplifies how truth is a matter of being spoken to, being claimed, and being changed. The truth emerging from art is an existential, practical one, rather than a purely theoretical one.

For Gadamer, truth is inextricably tied to our ability to recognize “something and oneself” (Truth and Method, 114). Unlike previous theories, however, that tied recognition to the ability to recognize the original presented by art, Gadamer emphasizes the future, rather than the past, as defining recognition. Recognition aimed at the truth of art stems not from its ability to mimic (or correspond to) an original but from its ability to bring to presence that which is truer than the original. To encounter the truth in art is not to look back to an original; art serves not as the mirror to the world-that-is-really-there, but as a means to opening one’s eyes to new ways of seeing and future possibilities. It is new visions not past ones that can count as true, and for this reason Gadamer insists that what is presented in art is actually more true than the alleged original it purports to imitate. But what does this mean and how does it reflect truth’s practical bent? Recognition thus requires more than objective seeing where one brackets one’s subjectivity and remains at an existential distance from the art. Recognition means being played by, drawn into, the work of art in such a way that one’s own being is altered. As Gadamer puts it, our encounter with art that produces truth occurs when we hear the art speaking as if directly to us: “it is not only the ‘This art thou!’ disclosed in a joyous and frightening shock; it also says to us; ‘Thou must alter thy life!’” (Philosophical Hermeneutics, 104). The neutral gaze of aesthetic consciousness affords no truth, for nothing is at stake, nothing is disturbed, and everything is left as it was before. For Gadamer, the truth of art refers to its practical ability to speak to, that is, change, the viewer. Art’s “mode,” then, is “presentation” (Truth and Method, 115) to the extent to which it presents an “essential” truth, where “essence” refers not to a stable, a priori, but to the relation established by our encounter with the art. To lose oneself in the play of art that then leads to a finding and a recognition of oneself—one that activates an envisioning of oneself in the future and not the past—is to experience truth. Gadamer writes, “In being played the play speaks to the spectator through its presentation; and it does so in such a way that, despite the distance between [the play and the spectator], the spectator still belongs to play” (116). The belongingness is not one that suggests a “deep, hidden truth,” as Dreyfus and Rabinow maintain, but rather one in which we experience ourselves made present with the art—which is possible only as we look ahead, envisioning ourselves anew.

To maintain the evential character of truth is to expose the dynamic nature of understanding, specifically in terms of a “double movement” (Barthold). Gadamer’s account of truth requires not only that one be drawn away from oneself and caught up in something larger than oneself, one must also “return to oneself.” Here, the “return to self” means the ability to grasp the meaning for oneself in a way that changes one. As we have seen, Gadamer does not just offer a critique of modern subjectivism, he also argues for the practical moment in which one feels compelled to change one’s life. The anti-subjective implication of Gadamer’s account of truth, to the extent it is a move away from oneself, is suggestive of the Platonic motion of ascendance. And the subsequent impetus for practical application, the return to oneself, reflects the descendance also reminiscent of Plato. If we do not engage in such a dynamic experience, one both in which one is caught up and from which one emerges changed, then one has not experienced truth. This hermeneutic account of truth refrains from explicating the method or the criteria required to arrive at a correct judgment. Instead it attempts to elucidate the more primordial sense of truth that underlies, but does not oppose, traditional accounts of truth like the correspondence and coherence theories.

b. Prejudice, Tradition, Authority, Horizon

In part II of Truth and Method Gadamer develops four key concepts central to his hermeneutics: prejudice, tradition, authority, and horizon. Prejudice (Vorurteil) literally means a fore-judgment, indicating all the assumptions required to make a claim of knowledge. Behind every claim and belief lie many other tacit beliefs;  it is the work of understanding to expose and subsequently affirm or negate them. Unlike our everyday use of the word, which always implies that which is damning and unfounded, Gadamer’s use of  “prejudice” is neutral: we do not know in advance which prejudices are worth preserving and which should be rejected. Furthermore, prejudice-free knowledge is neither desirable nor possible. Neither the hermeneutic circle nor prejudices are necessarily vicious. Against the enlightenment’s “prejudice against prejudice” (272) Gadamer argues that prejudices are the very source of our knowledge. To dream with Descartes of razing to the ground all beliefs that are not clear and distinct is a move of deception that would entail ridding oneself of the very language that allows one to formulate doubt in the first place. To further understand the vital role of prejudices, we must examine the role Gadamer assigns to tradition.

“Tradition,” like “prejudice,” is a term Gadamer develops beyond its everyday meaning. To affirm, as Gadamer does, that one can never escape from one’s tradition, does not mean he is insisting we endorse all traditions writ large. Gadamer is not espousing a conservative approach to tradition that blindly affirms the whole of a tradition and leaves one without recourse to critique it. Critics like Habermas and Ricoeur have faulted Gadamer for failing to insist on a critical response to tradition. These criticisms miss the mark for two reasons. First, accepting the fact that we can never entirely reflect oneself out of tradition does not mean that one cannot change and question one’s tradition. His point is that in as much as tradition serves as the condition of one’s knowledge, the background that instigates all inquiry, one can never start from a tradition-free place. A tradition is what gives one a question or interest to begin with. Second, all successful efforts to enliven a tradition require changing it so as to make it relevant for the current context. To embrace a tradition is to make it one’s own by altering it. A passive acknowledgment of a tradition does not allow one to live within it. One must apply the tradition as one’s own. In other words, the importance of the terms, “prejudice” and “tradition,” for Gadamer’s hermeneutics lies in the way they indicate the active nature of understanding that produces something new. Tradition hands down certain interests, prejudices, questions, and problems, that incite knowledge. Tradition is less a conserving force than a provocative one. Even a revolution, Gadamer notes, is a response to the tradition that nonetheless makes use of that very same tradition. Here we can also perceive the Hegelian influences on Gadamer to the extent that even a rejection of some elements of the tradition relies on the preservation of other elements, which are then understood (that is, taken up) in new ways. Gadamer desires not to affirm a blind and passive imitation of tradition, but to show how making tradition our own means a critical and creative application of it.

Similarly, true authority always requires an active acknowledgment by others. Without such an acknowledgment, one finds not true authority but passive submission resulting in tyranny. For, acknowledgment requires an active implementation of and reflection on the meaning of that authority for oneself—one based in knowledge not ignorance. Hence, understanding always has a built-in possibility for critique as we strive to make something our own and do not simply passively mimic it. Memorizing a text, for example, is no indication that one understands it; one has understood only when one can put the text into one’s own words, enlivening the text and allowing it to speak in new ways. That Gadamer’s point is not a conservative one is seen by the fact that change resulting in a new creation is the necessary result of all understanding.

Gadamer’s attention to the historical nature of understanding is captured by what he terms, “historically effected/effective consciousness” (Wirkungsgeschichtliches Bewusstein). But against historicism’s objectifying tendencies, Gadamer contends that historical situatedness does not result in restrictive limitations. For, limits are precisely what allow one to be open to what is new. It is in this context that one of Gadamer’s most misunderstood terms, namely, the “fusion of horizons,” is discussed. “Horizon” suggests the limits that make perspective possible and is marked by two main features. First, the concept of horizon suggests the situated and perspectival nature of knowing. Just as the visual (that is, literal) horizon provides the boundaries that allow one to see, so the epistemic horizon provides boundaries that make knowledge possible. Just as the literal horizon delimits one’s visual field, the epistemic horizon frames one’s situation in terms of what lies behind (that is, tradition, history), around (that is, present culture and society), and before (that is, expectations directed at the future) one. The concept of horizon thus connotes the way in which a located, perspectival knowing is yet a fecund one: without the limitation of a horizon there would be no seeing. The back- and fore-grounds requisite for knowledge are not hindrances to be overcome. For, the “view from nowhere” sees not; it is blinded by its own solipsism. A horizon, as Gadamer tells us, bespeaks the productively mediated relation between what is distant and near; it enables us to discern both what is close up and what is far away without excluding either of these positions (Truth and Method, 302). We could say that the concept of horizon meaningfully integrates the interpreter’s immediate environs and the more distant world-at-large.

Second, Gadamer stresses the open and dynamic nature of horizons. This point has been neglected in some of the secondary literature devoted to Gadamer’s conception of horizon and for this reason it is important to note that when Gadamer speaks of the horizon it is in a context in which he is trying to explain how we can have an intellectually vital relation with tradition or, as he puts it later, between “text and present”  (306). Against historicism, Gadamer argues that the ability of a contemporary interpreter to understand a text of the past does not presuppose two entirely distinct, reified horizons. It is the work of understanding to expose the unity to what at first glance is taken to be two distinct horizons, that is, past and present. Hence the “fusion” of horizons that signifies understanding. Rather than delineating a fixed and impenetrable space, Gadamer wants to highlight the capaciousness and expansiveness of a horizon: “horizon is. . . something into which we move and that moves with us. Horizons change for a person who is moving” (304). To defend horizons as distinct and fixed affirms the closed (304), incommensurable nature of horizons, where understanding, and thus truth, remains thwarted (303).

Since Gadamer denies the original diremption (separation) of discrete horizons, he rejects the assumption that understanding requires us to transpose ourselves into another, alien horizon. Horizons are not self-contained locations that can be entered into or departed from at will; they are not “objective” locations distinct from us as “subjects.” It is not the case, then, that understanding requires an act of will by which we transpose ourselves into the horizon of the other. The Hegelian themes are clear when Gadamer tells us that the transposition that occurs in the attempt to understand

always involves rising to a higher universality that overcomes not only our own particularity but also that of the other. The concept of “horizon” suggests itself because it expresses the superior breadth of vision that the person who is trying to understand must have. To acquire a horizon means that one learns to look beyond what is close at hand—not in order to look away from it but to see it better, within a larger whole and in truer proportion. (305)

The Hegelian aufhebung (sublation) underlying horizontal fusions means that whenever we are tempted to say that there are two completely distinct and incommensurate horizons we should confess the superficiality and incompleteness of such a description. That is to say, our initial efforts at trying to interpret an ancient text might make it seem as if the text does belong to an entirely different world, and Gadamer does not deny that the foreignness of the text sometimes seems to suggest its complete otherness. Misunderstanding can exacerbate the otherness of the other. But, accepting the initial challenge of difference as entailing ontologically real differences precludes change, and thus understanding. Instead, Gadamer invites us to conceive of difference as a means to transformation, which Gadamer terms “fusion of horizons.” The temptation to treat difference as an impossibility reflects a superficial response and affirms a rigid, reified notion of horizon. Noting the difference of temporally or spatially distant worlds, is, as Gadamer puts it, “only one phase in the process of understanding,” and we must take care not to “solidify” the “self-alienation of past consciousness” (306, 307). If we do so, then we will prevent the “real fusing of horizons. . . which means that as the historical horizon is projected, it is simultaneously superseded” (307). Refusing to reify difference means acknowledging that the process of understanding requires the ability to allow one’s own horizon to shift and change in light of the acknowledgment of the other, and vice versa. True understanding not only begins with difference but also requires all horizons to change; neither one’s own horizon nor that of the other is left intact (306-307). Fusion of horizons is not a war in which the dominant horizon swallows up the weaker one. In keeping with Gadamer’s anti-subjectivism, it is crucial to note that the “fusion of horizons” happens beyond our willing; the expanding of our horizon is not something we can fully control or bring about. Rather, it is through our effort to understand that a new horizon emerges.

But if there are not two reified horizons, neither is there a single, bounded horizon that occludes difference. Fusion refers to the active and the on-going nature of understanding—not a static, hegemonic unity. Any unity wrought by understanding is its effect—not its cause. Furthermore, such unity will never be total: understanding refers to a process not a final end. To defend a mono-culture is akin to positing a single, definite horizon and is thus to deny the very difference that initiates understanding in the first place. The productivity of such difference is attested to by Gadamer’s statement in his “Afterword” to Truth and Method: “what I described as a fusion of horizons was the form in which this unity [of the meaning of a work and its effect] actualizes itself, which does not allow the interpreter to speak of an original meaning of the work without acknowledging that, in  understanding it, the interpreter’s own meaning enters in as well. . . Working out the historical horizon of a text is always already a fusion of horizons” (576, 577).  Acknowledging that one can only access the viewpoint of another from within one’s own horizon is not a totalitarian effort to defend a mono-culture but a humble admission that one never can access directly the other’s perspective. Neither an imposed nor feigned sameness is the starting place; if they were there would be no work for understanding to do. Ascriptions of a mono-horizon belong to historicist positions that fail to note the complex nature of horizons that always, at least potentially, grant provisions for us moving beyond them. Gadamer’s account of horizon emphatically maintains that only where one is open to new horizons emerging—and hence difference—can one claim to understand. It falls to the work of the historical consciousness, which Gadamer seeks to undermine, to defend such a mono-cultural and reified picture of history and tradition. Hence, Gadamer’s theory is not forced to assume either a mono-cultural view of tradition or to posit mono-culture as the telos of understanding. Putting it in a slightly different way: difference is the occasion for—not an impediment to—understanding.

c. Dialectic, Dialogue, Language

Part II of Truth and Method closes with an analysis of Plato’s dialectic and the significance of dialogue for Gadamer’s hermeneutics. Gadamer’s understanding of these terms as well as how they are related bears comment. As we have seen, Gadamer distinguishes between early Platonic, later Platonic, and Hegelian dialectic and relies most heavily on the early Platonic dialectic due to its reliance on Socratic dialogue. The later Platonic and Hegelian dialectic he faults for their propositional and sentential reductionism. For Gadamer, dialectic instructs his own hermeneutics in so far as it suggests a productive tension that, contrary to Hegel's view, is never resolved. The lack of resolution suggests the fecundity of the “chorismos” (the separation between the sensual and transcendent realms) marking human existence and affirms our human status as “in-between.” If Gadamer’s hermeneutics can be called “dialectic” it is in the sense that Gadamer affirms that understanding is inseparable from dialogue and is marked by a constant and productive “chorismatic” tension between these two realms (Barthold).

For Gadamer, as for Plato, dialectic is inseparable from (although not reducible to) dialogue. One can point to four main components of dialogue in Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics. First, a dialogue is focused on die Sache, the subject matter. The aim of dialogue is not to win the other over to one’s side—it is not a debate. Nor does it aim at a subjective understanding of the other. Rather, both parties open themselves to coming to an agreement about the matter itself. Secondly, a dialogue requires that each party possesses a “good-will” to understand, that is, an openness to hear something anew in such a way as to forge a connection with another. Thus one could say that dialogic openness aims at solidarity. Third, a good dialogue entails a willingness to offer reasons and justifications for one’s views. One must be open not only to the voice of the other, but to make the effort to explain oneself to another. Finally, a good dialogue requires a commitment that one “knows one doesn’t know.” Dialogue requires a humble playfulness in which we get caught up and lose ourselves in the connection with another. A good dialogue is one that, like engaging play, is one we want to keep going. Thus we could see that the play of dialogue indicates the central motif of Gadamer’s notion of truth: “To reach an understanding in a dialogue is not merely a matter of putting oneself forward and successfully asserting one’s own point of view, but being transformed into a communion in which we do not remain what we were” (379). The intertwined nature of dialectic and dialogue, combined with dialogue’s connection to solidarity, reflects what Gadamer meant when he referred to his philosophical hermeneutics as “dialectical ethics” (“Gadamer on Gadamer”, 15).

Part III of Truth and Method turns to an analysis of language where Gadamer draws on his early fascination with Socratic dialogue in order to defend the importance of the linguistic nature of human existence. Referencing Augustine and Nicholas of Cusa, he goes on to stress the speculative nature of language in order to contend against those who would reduce language to propositions. Gadamer shows us how meaning comes through linguistic expression that relies on a whole (that is, Being) that is greater than its part (what is expressed in language, for example, propositions). This “totality” makes language possible and functions “not [as] an object but the world horizon that embraces us.” But it is crucial to emphasize that the sense of the speculative and the totality Gadamer insists upon here refuses the Hegelian finality: understanding does not aim at having the final word.

But neither is there the worry that we are somehow trapped inside language. Instead, Gadamer stresses the open and on-going nature of understanding that manifests itself in two ways. First, as we have seen, one is to remain open toward the other in order to keep the conversation going. Second, Gadamer stresses the openness on the part of language, which is never a restrictive, non-porous boundary, but a productive limit that makes possible the continual creation of new words and worlds. The first of these, that is, our openness to the on-going conversation we have with others is made possible by the second, that is, our shared pre-linguistic world of being. Thus when it comes to language, Gadamer refuses to reduce language to propositions—that is, tools that we use objectively. Instead he summons poetry as that which embodies what is essential to all language, namely, its status as “a medium where I and world meet, or, rather, manifest their original belonging together” (Truth and Method, 474). In this section, Gadamer proclaims his famous utterance, “Being that can be understood is language” (474). This claim means neither that everything is language nor that all Being is reducible to language. Language, Gadamer tells us towards the end of this section, is a type of presentation, a coming-into-being, that reveals the unity of beauty (that is, what we desire) and truth (what speaks to and changes us). Language, in other words, makes visible both truth and beauty. In this way, language reflects the hermeneutic experience in terms of being captivated by beauty and changed by truth, a truth that is irreducible to scientific method.

4. Critical Encounters

a. E.D. Hirsch

Two years prior to his 1967 book, Validity and Interpretation, E.D. Hirsch wrote a journal article criticizing Gadamer’s hermeneutics. Against Gadamer, Hirsch argued that meaning can only be found in the author’s intention and thus a good interpretation is one that successfully reconstructs and reproduces this original meaning. He accused Gadamer’s hermeneutics of substituting this sort of reconstruction of authorial intention with the interpreter’s own subjective construction. Essentially, Hirsch rejected Gadamer’s move to replace mimesis with application. Hirsch also attacked Gadamer’s reliance on prejudice, tradition, historicity and his notion of fusion of horizons. None of these notions, according to Hirsch, gives adequate emphasis to the importance of the interpreter suspending and bracketing her own subjective consciousness and taking on that of the author. (Thus Hirsch followed Dilthey’s and Schleiermacher’s emphasis on divining the intention of the author as the method of interpretation.) As a result, Gadamer’s hermeneutics is thought to lose its ability to claim objective status and remains unable to defend itself against charges of relativism. What this criticism overlooks, however, is that Gadamer insists his work is not a prescriptive or normative call to endorse prejudice, tradition or authority. It does not defend the passivity of the interpreter but the active and creative force at play in all interpretation. Neither did Gadamer intend “to offer a general theory of interpretation and a differential account of its methods. . .” Instead, Gadamer maintains that the insights of Truth and Method aim “to discover what is common to all modes of understanding and to show that understanding is never a subjective relation to a given ‘object’ but to the history of its effect; in other words, understanding belongs to the being of that which is understood” (Truth and Method, xxxi). Gadamer nowhere denies the importance of striving to be objective when interpreting a text; what he denies is the sufficiency and primacy of such “objectivity.”

b. Jürgen Habermas

In the nineteen-sixties Gadamer had been a supporter of Jürgen Habermas, urging against Max Horkheimer that Habermas be offered a job at Heidelberg before he had completed his Habilitation. While Habermas and Gadamer were united in their attack on the hubris of positivism, during the seventies an important philosophical disagreement between them took place that served to expand the sphere of Gadamer’s philosophical influence. While there were many fundamental points of agreement between Habermas and Gadamer, such as their starting place in the hermeneutic tradition that attempts a critique of the dominance of natural scientific method as well as their desire to return to the Greek notion of practical philosophy, Habermas argued that Gadamer’s emphasis on tradition, prejudice, and the universal nature of hermeneutics blinded him to ideological operations of power. Habermas interpreted Gadamer as calling for the elimination of method altogether and went on to argue that Gadamer’s hermeneutics thus leaves one without the ability to reflect critically upon the sources of ideology at play in the theoretical and material levels of society. Habermas asserted, “Hermeneutical consciousness is incomplete so long as it has not incorporated into itself reflection on the limit of hermeneutical understanding” (The Hermeneutic Claim to Universality, 302). Essentially, he accused Gadamer of failing to recognize the need to critique tradition, inferring that Gadamer disallows such a critique and endorses a dogmatic stand toward tradition. How do we know that the understanding we arrive at is distortion-free? Gadamer’s appeal to tradition, prejudice, and authority would seem to thwart any such critique. Gadamer, in turn, argued, that to refuse the universal nature of hermeneutics is itself the more dogmatic stance, for in so doing we affirm modernity’s deception that the subject can free itself from the past.

c. Jacques Derrida

While both Gadamer and Derrida were attentive to the role of language in life and philosophy, and both were followers of Heidegger, the content as well as the style of their philosophy differ greatly. For Gadamer, the very possibility of understanding requires a devotion to die Sache, the subject matter. Derrida’s deconstructionist claim is that to assume a subject matter, a singular point unifying the attention of understanding, is to endorse and remain ensnared by a metaphysics of presence. According to Derrida there is no subject matter, no “Truth,” only multiple perspectives and their deferral. In 1981, a “meeting” or “conversation” was arranged between Gadamer and Derrida at the Goethe Institute in Paris. However, what occurred fell far short of anything that could be called a philosophical dialogue. Why? Gadamer’s initial presentation aimed to defend Heidegger against Derrida’s charge that Heidegger fails to achieve the more radical philosophy of Nietzsche who insists that there is not truth, no single correct interpretation or agreement over a singular subject matter. Derrida’s “reply,” however, ignored the main trajectory of Gadamer’s points and instead attacked Gadamer for relying on a Kantian notion of the good will. Since Gadamer had mentioned only once (and in passing) the importance of being open to the other in a dialogue, Derrida seemed to overreach with his charge that Gadamer was therefore defending a Kantian notion of good will. Then, even more puzzlingly, in Derrida’s subsequent presentation, he addressed himself only to Heidegger and Nietzsche and made no mention at all of Gadamer’s hermeneutics. Yet if we characterize Gadamer’s hermeneutics as the elucidation of how understanding can succeed, and if we generalize Derrida’s deconstruction as the exposure of the misunderstandings, ruptures, and deviances that always present themselves when we try to understand, then perhaps, to the extent to which each philosopher embodied his own philosophy, a certain encounter (albeit not a dialogue) between philosophies did in fact occur.

5. Practical Philosophy: Hermeneutics Beyond Gadamer

a. Hermeneutics as Dialogue: Ethical and Political Interventions

Tracing the trajectory of Gadamer’s philosophical career, one might question whether Truth and Method deserves to be called his magnum opus or whether it is not one moment in his more important quest to recover the spirit of Plato.  If we are to take him at his word that Truth and Method offered us the foundations of hermeneutics, then we must ask, what is the magnum opus such a foundation undergirds? It would seem as if practical philosophy is the work, the edifice, Gadamer hoped would be sustained by his “foundations.”  This fact can be substantiated by his 1996 claim: “By hermeneutics I understand the ability to listen to the other in the belief that he could be right” (quoted in Gadamer: A Biography, 250). In other words, Gadamer realizes more fully the universalizing tendency in the history of hermeneutics: the event of understanding occurs not just in the realm of texts, and certainly not just in philosophy, but in the myriad ways we interact with and seek to connect with others.

The eagerness to conceive of the dialogical impetus of hermeneutics as a possible resource for resolving certain contemporary social and political crises in our world is found in much of the secondary literature on Gadamer. Gadamer’s work proves relevant for contemporary issues to the extent to which it neither appeals to prior, transcendent, eternal truths nor devolves into incommensurability. The desire to forge a third way “beyond objectivism and relativism” (Bernstein) captures the move by some thinkers to find social and political relevance in Gadamer’s hermeneutics (Warnke, Sullivan, Dallmayr). Political theorist and philosopher Fred Dallmayr, for instance, drawing on Gadamer, stresses “integral pluralism” as a way to avoid the isolated pluralism resulting from incommensurability. To what extent is it possible to interact rationally and dialogically in order to listen to the other and to advance human understanding that values the whole (that is, community) over the part (individual)? And feminist philosophers Georgia Warnke and Linda Martín Acloff have relied on Gadamer’s hermeneutics in their writings about justice, contemporary social issues, and gender.

b. Twentieth Century Anglo-American Appropriations

While Gadamer’s thought has been primarily formed by his interaction with German and Greek thinkers, it has been taken up by three of the most influential American philosophers of the later twentieth century, namely, the pragmatist Richard Rorty, and the philosophers of language, Robert Brandom and John McDowell. While coming from a very different philosophical tradition than Gadamer, both Brandom and McDowell have argued for the usefulness of Gadamer’s thought for contemporary discussions in philosophy of mind and philosophy of language. Richard Rorty, in his 1979 work, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, was one of the first Anglo-American philosophers explicitly to attest to the import of Gadamer’s hermeneutics. And while the term “hermeneutics” drops out of use in Rorty’s later work, evidence of Gadamer’s continued influence remains. In fact, one can find increasing connections among pragmatism and Gadamer. For example, contemporary American pragmatist Richard Bernstein finds Gadamer’s conception of the fluidity of horizons more promising than that of static paradigms for forging our way through contemporary multiculturalism and globalization. For, Gadamer’s rich and nuanced conception of dialogue avoids promoting either incommensurability or facile dialogue that denies the workings of power in language.

c. Applied Hermeneutics

That Gadamer’s work has also found application in psychology (Chessick), education (Gallagher), ethics (Foster, Smith, Vilhauer), political theory (Dallmayr, Kögler, Sullivan, Warnke), sports (Hyland), and theology (Ringma, Thiselton) affirms Gadamer’s claim that “a good test of the idea of hermeneutics itself” is its ability to find translation in other fields (The Philosophy of Hans-Georg Gadamer, 17). How to make the questions of our history, of our tradition, speak again to us—not solely within the halls of the academy with its “scholarshipism” (as Gadamer terms it) but to the practical concerns of our age? This is the task Gadamer’s hermeneutic philosophy calls us to.  Thus the continued relevance of Gadamer’s thought for contemporary philosophy, particularly of a social and political bent, serves to endorse Gadamer’s own claim about the practical relevance of his hermeneutics: “The hermeneutic task of integrating the monologic of the sciences into the communicative consciousness includes the task of exercising practical, social, and political reasonability. This has become all the more urgent” (Philosophical Apprenticeships, 182).

In closing, we can concur with Robert Dostal who clarifies that although Gadamer himself wrote no ethics or political philosophy per se, there is in his hermeneutics a “basic posture” oriented toward just these concerns, to the extent that he urges us to listen, truly listen, to what the other says in trust that she or he may be right. And that this is a posture that extends beyond the realm of academic philosophy can be seen in Gadamer’s own life. Dostal reflects, “The ethic of this hermeneutic is an ethic of respect and trust that calls for solidarity. Gadamer himself embodies this ethic, not only in his work, but also in his life. All those who have encountered him, whether they find themselves in agreement with him or not, have found him, like the Socrates he so much admired, always ready for conversation” (32). And like Socrates’ death, Gadamer’s death did not put an end to our conversation with him.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Collected Works in German

  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Gesammelte Werke. Tübigen: J.C.B. Mohr (Paul Siebeck).

b. Main Books by Gadamer in English

  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Hegel’s Dialectic: Five Hermeneutical Studies. Trans. P.      Christopher Smith. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1976.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Philosophical Hermeneutics. Trans. and ed. David E. Linge. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1977.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Dialogue and Dialectic. Trans. P. Christopher Smith. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1980.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Philosophical Apprenticeships. Trans. Robert R. Sullivan. Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press, 1985.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Idea of the Good in Platonic-Aristotelian Philosophy. Trans. and with an introduction and annotation by P. Christopher Smith. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1986.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Dialogue and Deconstruction. Ed. Diane P. Michelfelder and Richard E. Palmer. Albany: SUNY Press, 1989.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. “Gadamer on Gadamer.” In Gadamer and Hermeneutics, ed. Hugh Silverman. New York: Routledge Press, 1991a.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Plato’s Dialectical Ethics. Trans. Robert M. Wallace. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1991b.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Hans-Georg Gadamer on Education, Poetry, and History. Ed. Dieter Misgeld and Graeme Nicholson. Trans. Lawrence Schmidt and Monica Reuss. Albany: SUNY Press, 1992.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Truth and Method. 2nd ed. Trans. Joel Weinsheimer and Donald G. Marshall. N.Y.: Crossroad, 1992.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Reason in the Age of Science. Trans. Frederick G. Lawrence. Mass.: MIT Press, 1992.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Heidegger’s Ways. Trans. John W. Stanley. Albany: SUNY Press, 1994.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Enigma of Health. Trans. Jason Gaiger and Nicholas Walker. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1996.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Relevance of the Beautiful. Ed. Robert Bernasconi. Trans. Nicholas Walker. N.Y.: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Beginning of Philosophy. Trans. Rod Coltman. N.Y.: Continuum, 1998.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg.. Praise of Theory. Trans. Chris Dawson. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1998.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Hermeneutics, Religion, and Ethics. Trans. Joel Weinsheimer. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1999.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Gadamer in Conversation. Ed. and trans. Richard E. Palmer. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2001.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Beginning of Knowledge. Trans. Rod Coltman. N.Y.: Continuum, 2002.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. A Century of Philosophy. Trans. Rod Coltman with Sigrid Koepke. N.Y.: Continuum, 2004.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. The Gadamer Reader: A Bouquet of the Later Writings. Ed. Richard E. Palmer. Ill.: Northwestern University Press, 2007.

c. Selected Secondary Literature

  • Alcoff, Linda Martín. Visible Identities. New York: Oxford, 2006.
  • Barthold, Lauren Swayne. Gadamer’s Dialectical Hermeneutics. Lanham, MD: Lexington, 2010.
  • Bernstein, Richard. Beyond Objectivism and Relativism. Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania, 1983.
  • Brandom, Robert. Tales of the Mighty Dead. Massachusetts:  Harvard University,   2002.
  • Chessick, Richard. “Hermeneutics of Psychotherapists,” American Journal of Psychotherapy 44 (1990), 256-73.
  • Dallmayr, Fred. Integral Pluralism: Beyond Culture Wars. Kentucky: University of Kentucky, 2010.
  • Dostal, Robert J. ed. The Cambridge Companion to Gadamer. New York: Cambridge, 2002.
  • Foster, Matthew. Gadamer and Practical Philosophy. Atlanta: Scholars, 1991.
  • Gallagher, Shaun. Hermeneutics and Education. Albany: SUNY, 1994.
  • Grondin, Jean. Gadamer: A Biography, trans. Joel Weinsheimer. New Haven: Yale University, 2003.
  • Grondin, Jean. Introduction to Philosophical Hermeneutics. New Haven: Yale University, 1994.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. “The Hermeneutic Claim to Universality.” The Hermeneutic      Tradition. Gayle Ormiston and Alan Schrift, ed. Albany: SUNY, 1990.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. “A Review of Gadamer’s Truth and Method.” The Hermeneutic Tradition. Gayle Ormiston and Alan Schrift, ed. Albany: SUNY, 1990.
  • Hahn, Lewis Edwin, ed. The Philosophy of Hans-Georg Gadamer. Chicago: Open Court, 1997.
  • Hirsch, E.D. “Truth and Method in Interpretation.” Review of Metaphysics 18 (1965), 488-507.
  • Hirsch, E.D. Validity in Interpretation. New Haven: Yale University, 1967.
  • Hollinger, Robert, ed. Hermeneutics and Praxis. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame, 1985.
  • Hyland, Drew. Philosophy of Sport. St. Paul, Minn.: Paragon House, 1990.
  • Kögler, Hans Herbert. The Power of Dialogue: Critical Hermeneutics after Gadamer and Foucault. Translated by Paul Hendrickson. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT, 1996.
  • Krajewski, Bruce, ed. Gadamer’s Repercussions. Berkeley: University of California, 2004.
  • Lugones, Maria. “Playfulness, "World"-Traveling, and Loving Perception,” Hypatia 2 (1987), 3-19.
  • McDowell, John. Mind and World. Cambridge, Mass.,: Harvard, 1996.
  • Michelfelder, Diane P. and Richard E. Palmer. Dialogue and Deconstruction: The  Gadamer-Derrida Encounter. Albany: SUNY, 1989.
  • Orozco, Theresa. “The Art of Allusion: Hans-Georg Gadamer’s Philosophical Interventions Under National Socialism,” Radical Philosophy 78 (1996), 17            26.
  • Ringma, Charles Richard. Gadamer’s Dialogical Hermeneutics. Heidelberg: Universitätsverlag C. Winter, 1999.
  • Rorty, Richard. Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. New Jersey: Princeton, 1979.
  • Rorty, Richard. “Being That Can Be Understood Is Language.” Gadamer’s Repercussions. Ed., Bruce Krajewski. Berkeley: University of California, 2004.
  • Smith, P. Christopher. The Ethical Dimension of Gadamer’s Hermeneutical Theory. Research in Phenomenology 18 (1988), 75-91.
  • Sullivan, Robert. Political Hermeneutics. Pa.: Pennsylvania State University, 1989.
  • Thiselton, Anthony C. The Two Horizons. Grand Rapids: W.B. Eerdmans, 1980.
  • Vilhauer, Monica. Gadamer’s Ethics of Play. Lanham, MD: Lexington, 2010.
  • Warnke, Georgia. Gadamer: Hermeneutics, Tradition and Reason. Stanford: Stanford University, 1987.
  • Warnke, Georgia.Walzer, Rawls, and Gadamer: Hermeneutics and Political Theory. In Festivals of Interpretation, ed. Kathleen Wright. Albany: SUNY, 1990.
  • Warnke, Georgia. Justice and Interpretation. Mass.: MIT, 1993.
  • Warnke, Georgia. Legitimate Differences. Berkeley: University of California, 1999.
  • Weinsheimer, Joel C. Gadamer’s Hermeneutics. New Haven: Yale University, 1999.


Author Information

Lauren Swayne Barthold
Email: lauren.barthold@gordon.edu
Gordon College
U. S. A.

Marie de Rabutin-Chantal, Marquise de Sévigné (1626—1696)

De SevigneMadame de Sévigné was France’s preeminent writer of epistles in the seventeenth century. She appears at first glance to possess few philosophical credentials because she neither received formal philosophical instruction nor composed philosophical treatises. Yet in her extensive correspondence, De Sévigné develops a distinctive position on the philosophical disputes of her era. Rejecting the mechanistic account of nature, she supports a realist philosophy of nature, especially sensitive to the aesthetic structure of the cosmos. Sympathetic to Jansenism, De Sévigné develops a philosophy of God that stresses the divine will and the omnipresence of divine causation. Her moral psychology explores the amatory structure of human desire and the difficulty of accepting one’s mortality. Representative of neoclassicism, her philosophy of art privileges the values of harmony, proportion, and balance. An avid reader of theological and philosophical works, she provides a running commentary on the theories of her favorite contemporary authors. Her letters reflect the intellectual sophistication of the period’s salon culture, where the philosophical controversies spawned by Cartesianism had become the object of everyday discussion.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Nature
    2. Religion
    3. Moral Psychology
    4. Art
    5. Philosophical Chronicle
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born on February 5, 1626, Marie de Rabutin-Chantal belonged to an ancient Burgundian aristocratic family. Her most famous ancestor was her paternal grandmother Jeanne de Chantal, the founder of the Visitation order of nuns, who was canonized a saint in 1767. Her father Celse-Bénigne de Rabutin, baron de Chantal, died during battle with the English on the island of Rhé in 1627. Her mother Marie de Coulanges, baroness de Chantal, died in 1633. The guardianship of the orphan passed to her maternal uncle Philippe de Coulanges, abbé de Livry.

Under Coulanges’s direction, the young Marie received a solid classical education.  She studied Italian, Spanish, and Latin. She read passages from Virgil in the original Latin. The poet Jean Chapelain and the linguist Gilles Ménage, who would later write The History of Women Philosophers in1690, served as tutors.

On August 4 1644, Marie married Marquis Henri de Sévigné, scion of an ancient Breton noble family. The newly married couple shared their time between the husband’s ancestral Breton residence, Les Rochers, and their Parisian townhouse in the Place des Vosges, where they participated in the life of the capital’s salons. Madame de Sévigné gave birth to a daughter, Françoise in 1646 and to a son, Charles in 1648. Her husband perished ingloriously in 1651 in the course of a duel he fought over his mistress.

The handsome and wealthy widow was the object of numerous marriage proposals, but Madame de Sévigné never remarried. She became a regular participant in the literary salon of the Hôtel de Rambouillet. During the civil war of the Fronde in1648-52, she alternately opposed and supported the royalist party. She formed a close friendship with finance minister Nicolas Fouquet, whom she would openly support during his trial and imprisonment after he fell from power in the court of Louis XIV.

Among her salon acquaintances, Sévigné counted numerous prominent authors: the memorialist Cardinal de Retz, the novelist Madame Lafayette, the moralist La Rochefocuauld, and the Cartesian essayist Corbinelli. She participated in the literary quarrels of the time, championing Corneille over Racine and becoming the object of satire in works by her cousin, the chronicler Bussy-Rabutin. An avid reader, Sévigné studied a wide range of ancient and modern works. Among the classics, she preferred Virgil, Quintilian, and Tacitus; among Italian authors, Tasso and Ariosto; among French authors, Corneille, Molière, La Fontaine, Montaigne, and Rabelais. In theological literature, she preferred Saint Augustine and the neo-Augustinian authors of the Jansenist movement: Pascal and Nicole. She had a pronounced taste for pulpit oratory, the Jesuit Bourdaloue being her favorite preacher. Her correspondence frequently cited the conversations and books she has encountered. The writings of the neo-Augustinian moralistes proved particularly influential in the development of Sévigné’s philosophical theories.

In 1669 her daughter Françoise de Sévigné married François d’Adhémar, count of Grignan. When the Grignans moved to Provence in 1671 so that the Count of Grignan could fulfill a military commission, Madame de Sévigné faced an emotional crisis. Openly admitting her idolatrous love for her daughter, Sévigné could not accept the daughter’s absence. The solution was the initiation of a correspondence between mother and daughter, which would eventually include hundreds of letters. Her other correspondents included Charles de Sévigné, Abbé de Coulanges, and Bussy-Rabutin.

During her last decades, Sévigné alternated her residence between the estate at Les Rochers and her celebrated Parisian mansion, Hôtel de Carnavalet. She made numerous trips to visit her daughter, who became a partisan of Descartes. Sévigné’s ardent attachment to her daughter was not reciprocated by Madame de Grignan, who found her mother’s frequent letters and visits suffocating. Sévigné fared little better with her son Charles, whose career as a military officer was followed by a life of profligate expenses and sexual dissipation.

Madame de Sévigné died from small pox at Madame de Grignan’s estate on April 17, 1696.

2. Works

The letters of Madame de Sévigné only slowly became a published collection of correspondence. During her lifetime, individual letters were already copied and read by members of her social circle. Circulation of letters and memoirs was not unusual in the era’s salons. The preeminent literary quality of the letters quickly established them as favored salon reading.

Bussy-Rabutin provided the first print version of Sévigné’s letters, embedded within editions of his own writings, published in 1696, 1697, and 1709. Her granddaughter Madame de Simiane supervised the first edition of her letters to Madame de Grignan in 1726; Chevalier de Perrin published a corrected edition of these letters in 1734, 1737, and 1754. An edition of newly discovered letters was published in 1773. The eighteenth-century editions of Sévigné’s correspondence should be treated with caution since the editors often corrected the prose of the letters to suit the tastes of the period.

In the nineteenth century the recognizable canon of Sévigné’s correspondence emerged. L.-J.-N. Monmerqué, after publishing editions of previously unpublished letters in 1824 and 1827, edited the 14-volume edition of the complete correspondence of Sévigné. This volume included letter fragments and newly discovered, previously unpublished, letters in 1862-66. After many expanded editions of her writings, Roger Duchêne’s 3-volume critical edition of Sévigné’s correspondence published in 1972-78 became the standard reference for scholars.

The wide diffusion of Sévigné’s writings was due primarily to the French academic establishment. Beginning in the nineteenth century, French secondary school officials used textbook and anthology versions of Sévigné’s letters to provide students with a model of epistolary French prose. Countless French courses throughout the French empire and the non-Francophone world followed the lead of French education ministers and incorporated the works of Sévigné into their curriculum.

3. Philosophical Themes

Madame de Sévigné repeatedly admits to her daughter, an ardent disciple of Descartes, that she is not a systematic philosopher. Despite this, in her correspondence, Sévigné presents her personal position on contested philosophical questions of the day. In many passages she defends her theories concerning nature, religion, moral psychology, and art. If conversant with the Cartesianism of the salons, she is personally more sympathetic to the austere Jansenism of Pascal. Her correspondence is a chronicle of the philosophical debates of her era. As Sévigné recounts in salon conversations and in comments on her extensive reading, one overhears the philosophical quarrels which agitated the learned aristocracy of the period.

a. Nature

As commentators have long noted, Sévigné’s account of nature often appears to be a forerunner of romanticism. Nature is the place of an incomparable beauty best pursued in disciplined solitude. Sévigné opposes the Cartesian conception of nature as a machine reducible to mathematical attributes of extension and movement.

Sévigné’s opposition to the mechanistic theory of nature appears most clearly in her defense of nonhuman animals as ensouled beings. The easily observable conduct of pets indicates the mental and volitional actions of which they are capable.

Speak…about your machines, the machines which love, the machines which make an election of someone, the machines which are jealous, the machines which fear. Now go on; you are mocking us. Descartes never should have tried to make us believe this [Letter to Madame de Grignan; September 15, 1680].

The Cartesian theory of the machine-beast defies the data of common sense and empties nature of the various ensouled entities which populate it.

Sévigné praises those Cartesians who reject the mechanistic account of animals and defend the theory of the thinking animal.

He [Abbé de Montigny] spoke about the small parts [Cartesian language for atoms, the smallest particles of material objects] with this bishop [Bishop of Léon], who is a red-hot Cartesian, but with the same passion he also supported the theory that animals think [Letter to Madame de Grignan; September 2, 1671].

Opposed to the mechanistic conception of nature, Sévigné conceives nature in aesthetic terms. Nature is a place of enchantment where the engaged observer experiences a beauty which exists in no other physical setting.

These woods are always beautiful; their greenness is a hundred times more beautiful than that of Livry. I do not know whether it is due to the quality of the trees or to the freshness of the rains, but there can be no comparison. Everything today has the same green it had during the month of May. The leaves which fall are dead but those holding on are still green. You have never gazed on such beauty [Letter to Madame de Grignan; October 20, 1675].

The site of ecstatic beauty, nature becomes quasi-miraculous.

Such beautiful natural sites serve a key anthropological purpose: they permit human beings to exercise the soul’s highest faculties in solitude. In many passages Sévigné summons her daughter to experience the spiritual peace possible only within the solitary embrace of nature.

You are thirsting to be alone. Then by God, my beloved, come to our woods! It is a perfect solitude. We are having such splendid weather there that I spend all day there until night arrives. I think about you there a thousand or two thousand times with such tenderness that I would betray it if I believed I could describe it in writing [Letter to Madame de Grignan; December 22, 1675].

It is in such a natural oasis that the soul’s capacity for introspection, religious contemplation, and loving desire can flourish.

The garden constitutes the summit of human art, perfecting the bounty of nature and transforming it for the purposes of the meditative soul.

We are in a perfect solitude here and I find myself better for it. This park is much more beautiful than anything you have ever seen. The shade created by my small trees creates a beauty that was not so well projected by the sticks we used to have [Letter to Madame de Grignan; July 19, 1671].

In such a perfected natural refuge human thought and desire can reach their apex.

b. Religion

Many passages in the correspondence deal with theological issues. Sévigné’s concept of God draws primarily from Jansenism.This neo-Augustinian movement stresses divine sovereignty, predestination, the depth of human sinfulness, and complete dependence on grace for salvation. Her letters reference the many Jansenist authors who shape her theological perspective: Blaise Pascal, Pierre Nicole, Antoine Arnauld, Robert Arnauld d’Andilly, and Saint-Cyran. She describes the convent of Port Royal-des-Champs, the citadel of the Jansenist movement, with the enthusiasm of an acolyte.

This Port-Royal is a Thebiade [an austere, secluded place similar to that inhabited by the desert fathers of the church]. It is paradise. It is a desert where all the devotion of Christianity is spread out. It is a holiness radiating out into all the territory for a mile around it. There are five or six unknown solitaries [lay male auxiliaries of the convent] who live like the penitents in the days of John Climacus [a theologian of the desert fathers]. The nuns are angels on earth [Letter to Madame de Grignan; January 26, 1674].

Nonetheless, Sévigné absorbs this Jansenist theological culture with her characteristic moderation and irony. When a dispute breaks out over whether Jansenists should give written submission in relation to a church condemnation of several theses allegedly defended by Jansenius, she sides with neither the seigneuses nor the nonseigneuses.

Here is another example of caution. Our sisters of Saint Martha told me, “At last, may God be praised!  God has touched the heart of this poor child [a signeuese]; she has been placed in the path of obedience and salvation.” From there I went to Port-Royal.  There I found a certain esteemed solitaire that you know.  He started by telling me, “Well, this poor gosling has signed.  Finally, God has abandoned her.  She has jumped away from him.”  As for myself, I thought I would die laughing in reflecting on their preoccupations.  Now, here is the world in all its natural color.  I believe that the middle between these extremities is always better [Letter to Madame de Grignan; November 21, 1664].

Faithful to Jansenist theology, Sévigné stresses the divine will as God’s central attribute.  Even the smallest occurrences in everyday life reflect the silent work of God’s ordering of time.  The fulcrum of Sévigné’s emotional life, the rhythm of physical separation and union with her daughter is ultimately governed by God’s volition.

My dearly beloved, we’ve arrived at the point where we must go, must desire, and must pass our days one after the other just as God has pleased to give them to us. Following your example, I want to abandon myself to the sweet hope of seeing and embracing you in the upcoming month.  I want to believe that God will permit us to have this perfect joy, although nothing in the world is so easy as adding some bitterness to this joy, if we so desire. There is no moment of rest in this life. It is a goodness of Providence that that we make a truce concerning those sad reflections which could clearly disturb us on a daily basis [Letter to Madame de Grignan; Letter of July 1, 1685].

Psychological movements and physical actions reflect God’s sovereign will in the working out of history.

This omnipresence of the divine will’s activity is expressed as divine providence in the life in the individual. Discrete events in an individual’s life express in fact a providential design for the person.

Providence guides us with so much goodness in all these different times of our life that we practically do not feel it at all. This movement takes place very gradually; it is imperceptible. It is the quiet hand of the sundial we do not see at work. If at the age of twenty, we were given a glimpse of our older state in our family and someone made us see in the mirror the face we have now and the face we will have when we are sixty, the comparison between the two would make us collapse. We would be terrified. But we advance day by day. Today we are like yesterday; tomorrow we will be like today. Thus, we move on without feeling it. This is one of the miracles of Providence which I adore [Letter to Moulceau; January 27, 1687].

Under the guise of Providence, the divine will’s actions become an object of devotion.

The light of faith reveals the presence of divine providence at work in what appear to be unrelated episodes of human action, although the nature and outcome of the divine will’s actions remain obscure.

We cannot see underneath the cards, but it is this Providence which guides us along these extraordinary paths. Far from revealing the end of the novel, this action does not permit us to draw any conclusions from it or to offer any reproaches against it. Therefore, we must return to our starting point and accept without murmuring all that it pleases God to do to us [Letter to Bussy-Rabutin; August 13, 1688].

This emphasis on the inscrutable nature of divine providence echoes the Jansenist insistence on the radical darkening of the human intellect, occasioned by the fall and propagated by human concupiscence.

Sévigné’s emphasis on the omnipresence of divine providence tends to reduce all causation to one cause: God. Like other Jansenist philosophers, Sévigné so underscores the omnipotence and sovereignty of God that secondary causes tend to recede, if not to disappear.

As Monsieur d’Angers says, one must let God do as he wills and ceaselessly look to his will and his providence. Without that, there is no other way to live in the world. Otherwise, one will do nothing but complain about all these poor secondary causes [Letter to Madame de Grignan; July 1, 1685].

Part of metaphysical wisdom is to grasp the unique divine causation operative behind the apparent and often contradictory secondary causes. These causes wrongly dominate the concerns of most human beings.

The philosophical emphasis on divine causation is tied to a theological emphasis on the doctrine of predestination. Even in small gestures of piety, it is the divine will which causes the virtuous actions of the Christian subject. The sacramental action of a friend of Sévigné illustrates this truth.

God gave her a very particular grace, one which indicates a true predestination. It is that she went to confession on the octave of Corpus Christ with a perfect disposition and an affection that could only come from God. She then received Our Lord [in communion] in the same manner [Letter to Madame de Guitaut; June 3, 1693].

The devout soul died shortly afterward in the state of grace.

Given the centrality of the will among the divine attributes, surrender to God’s will becomes the central spiritual disposition to be cultivated by the human subject. Indeed, sanctity is nothing but complete submission to the divine will. Sévigné’s moral portrait of her friend Corbinelli underscores the volitional foundation of sanctity.

He is a man who only thinks about destroying his own willfulness, who never ceases to commune with the enemies of the devil, who are the saints of the church, a man who counts as nothing his miserable body, who suffers poverty Christianly (you would say philosophically), who never ceases to celebrate the perfections and the existence of God, who passes his life in charity and service of his neighbor, who does not seek his own delights and pleasures, and who is completely submitted to the will of God [Letter to Madame de Grignan; January 15, 1690].

Like other Jansenist authors, Sévigné does not explain why this submission to the divine will is so important and so difficult, given the existence of a deterministic universe in which the divine will is omnipresent.

Authentic abandonment to the divine will manifests itself by a sharp opposition to the world. Sévigné’s portrait of a friend who has recently undergone a religious conversion indicates the strictness of this separation.

She told me it was true that God had given her graces, for which she was profoundly grateful. These graces are nothing other but a profound faith, a tender love of God, and a horror of the world, accompanied by a great distrust of herself and of her weaknesses. She is convinced that if she takes a pause from this for a moment, the divine grace would evaporate [Letter to Madame de Grignan; January 15, 1674.]

Echoing neo-Augustinian theology, this rigorous flight from the world stresses the grave sinfulness and concupiscence of a world disfigured by the fall and original sin.

Sévigné openly admits her own incapacity to live the austere renunciation from the world which she commends in her writing. She often laments her own spiritual mediocrity.

One of my great desires is to be devout….I belong neither to God nor to the devil. This state disturbs me, but between us, I find it the most natural thing in the world. We are not given to the devil because we fear God and at bottom we have religious principles; we are not given to God because his law is hard and because we don’t like to destroy ourselves. This is how the tepid operate. Their great number doesn’t bother me at all. But God hates them. So I must leave this state; there is the problem [Letter to Madame de Grignan; June 10, 1671].

Like many salonnières sympathetic to Jansenism, with its rigorous asceticism, Sévigné discovers that her aristocratic lifestyle would permit her to follow the path of renunciation only so far.

In developing her religious philosophy, Sévigné criticized two intellectual currents which she finds to be erroneous: libertinism and the Molinism of the Jesuits. Among the libertines, she singled out Ninon de Lenclos (1620-1705) for specific criticism. A religious skeptic and an emblem of sexual license, Lenclos embodied the anti-Christian creed of the more freethinking salons. “This Ninon is dangerous! If you knew how she dogmatized about religion, you would be horrified. Her zeal for perverting young people is similar to that of Monsieur Saint-Germain, whom we once saw at Livry” [Letter to Madame de Grignan; April 1, 1671]. Sévigné’s invective against Lenclos was sharpened by the fact that her own son Charles had been involved in a liaison with the famous courtesan. She also recognizes that Lenclos represented an intellectual threat to Christian orthodoxy because  the courtesan promoted her sensual Epicureanism through a series of lectures she presented at her salon and a series of letters distributed by her admirers.

Luis de Molina (1535-1600) and his Jesuit confreres propagated  another extreme in the long-simmering theological quarrel over grace ,the error of Molinism, an exaggerated defense of the role of free will in the act of salvation. Sévigné lamented the leaning of one of her granddaughters toward Molinism after having abandoned the strict Augustinianism of the convent of Gif. “It is certain that after having been at the school of Saint Augustine she finds herself at the school of Molina. This is not something to be endured” [Letter to Madame de Grignan; July 1, 1685]. Both the materialism of the salon libertines and the spiritual libertarianism of the Jesuits erred in their divergences from the Jansenist theories of divine causation, divine sovereignty, human sinfulness, free will, and the operations of grace.

c. Moral Psychology

Like other moralistes of the period, Sévigné studies the various psychic states of the human subject, especially those states which reveal a divided heart. She openly admits the many occasions when she herself participates in this psychological perplexity. Two phenomena in particular attract her analytic attention: the experience of human love and the difficulty in accepting one’s mortality.

In the era’s salon debates, the passion of love held pride of place. Salon authors disputed the nature of love, puzzled over its power, and distinguished the various gradations of love. In her own reflections on love, Sévigné considers love a passion so powerful that it structures personal time. The beginning, end, and recommencement of loving relationships constitute one’s personal history.

I don’t believe that I have ever read anything as moving as the account you [Bussy-Rabutin] have given me of your farewell to your mistress. Your point that love is a true re-commencer is so beautiful and so true that I am astonished that, although I’ve thought this a thousand times, I never had the wit to say it. Sometimes I’ve even noticed that friendship wanted to insert itself into this in order to alter love and that in its own way it was also a true re-commencer [Letter to Bussy-Rabutin; October 7, 1655].

The passage attends to the gradations of love, such as the difference between romantic love and more disinterested friendship. In its various guises, this passion shapes the human psyche by its incessant starts, ends, and revivals.

The empire of love reveals the irreducible power of emotions in human life. Sévigné openly admits that the passions are so dominant in her own personality that she could never subscribe to the fashionable Stoicism of the salons; a moral code based on reason and duty alone would be insupportable.

Love my tenderness, love my weaknesses. As for myself, I am very well adjusted to them.  I like them far more than the sentiments of Seneca and Epictetus. My dear child, I am sentimental and affectionate up to the point of madness [Letter to Madame de Grignan; March 18, 1671].

Sévigné recognizes that in her ardent affection for her daughter love has reached the level of idolatry. The attempt to eliminate and reduce the power of love and associated passions like anger can only end in failure.

The letters also reflect a preoccupation with death.  As many commentators have noted, Sévigné dwells at length on the state funerals of France’s leading political and military figures.  She has a particular love for the genre of the funeral oration. In Sévigné’s perspective, the capacity to face and accept one’s mortality constitutes an essential trait of psychological maturity. Only then can one grasp one’s proper position in a mortal, perishing universe governed by an eternal God.

Life is brief and you [Bussy-Rabutin] are already well advanced in age. There’s no need to become impatient about it. This consolation [during a moment of misfortune] is a sad one and this remedy to your ill is worse than bad. Nonetheless, it should have its effect; so should the scarcely happier thought of the little place we have in the universe and how, in the end, it matters little whether the Count de Bussy was happy or unhappy. I know that during the tiny moment we are in this life we want to be completely happy but we must be convinced that nothing is more impossible and that if you didn’t have the worries you currently have, you would have others, according to the order of Providence [Letter to Bussy-Rabutin; August 13, 1688].

Sobering, the frank recognition of one’s mortality and one’s finiteness in the divine scheme of the universe permits the human subject to place the emotional turmoil in the pursuit of happiness within a framework of resignation.

d. Art

From the time of her early correspondence with her tutor Ménage, Sévigné revealed her aesthetic preoccupations. Many letters present her critical judgments concerning particular authors, books, and dramas. Her aesthetic judgment reflects the neoclassical tastes of her milieu; harmony, balance, and proportion emerge as the central traits of artistic quality.  Questions of form dominate her critical evaluation of the artworks which pass under review.

In literature, the capacity to appreciate a work lies largely in the ability to detect and savor its interior harmony. The classics of antiquity and the Italian Renaissance reveal this interior proportion.

Your readings are good. Petrarch must entertain you with the commentary you have. The one Mademoiselle Scudéry has made for us on certain sonnets makes them pleasant to read. As for Tacitus, you know how I was charmed by him during your recitations and how I often interrupted you to make you understand the passages where I found some harmony [Letter to Madame de Grignan; June 28, 1671].

The ability to isolate and appreciate the interior balance of a literary work is the central condition for its proper aesthetic appreciation. Despite her preference for the dramas of Corneille, Sévigné admits her admiration for Racine’s Esther. Originally performed by the students at Madame de Maintenon’s academy at Saint-Cyr, the biblical drama perfectly allies religious truth to a careful balance of its component parts.

As for Esther, I am in no way taking back all the praise which I already gave it.  All my life I will be delighted by the perfection and the novelty of the show. I am thrilled by it.  I found in it a thousand things so right, so well placed, so important to say to a king, that I would be delighted with the greatest conviction to say that it presented the greatest truths as it entertained and sang to us. I was moved by all these different beauties [Letter to Madame de Grignan; Letter of March 23, 1689].

Allied to the scriptural truths of supplication by an oppressed Israel, Esther provokes this aesthetic delight through its careful arrangement of a thousand things in a perfect harmony. It is this formal composition of disparate parts which constitutes the poignant beauty of Racine’s drama.

As in literature and theater, harmony forms the key criterion in the judgment of visual art. A spectacular temporary mausoleum designed by Le Brun in the church of the Oratoire elicits Sévigné’s praise. The exhibit not only perfectly balances its physical decorations; it brilliantly evokes the spiritual balance among the fine arts and among the moral virtues.

The mausoleum touched the ceiling and was decorated with a thousand lights and several figures appropriate to the deceased one wanted to praise. Four skeletons at the bottom were decorated with marks of his dignity, as if they had removed his honors as they had removed his life. One of them carried his staff, another his ducal crown, another signs of his rank, another the vestment of chancellor. The four Arts were bent over and desolate because they had lost their protector: they were Painting, Music, Eloquence, and Sculpture. Four Virtues supported the previous presentation: Force, Justice, Temperance, and Religion. Four angels or four genies received this beautiful soul above it all. In addition, the mausoleum was decorated with angels who held up a funeral tent suspended from the ceiling. Nowhere has there ever been anything so magnificent, so perfectly imagined. It is the masterpiece of Le Brun [Letter to Madame de Grignan; May 6, 1672].

It is the intricate harmony among the varied physical, aesthetic, moral, and religious components which gives Le Brun’s baroque construction its overwhelming aesthetic impact.

In her valorization of aesthetic pleasure, Sévigné criticizes a censorship which would eliminate certain works of art on the grounds of alleged immorality. “You know that I do not accommodate myself well with all this prudery which does not come naturally to me. I don’t consent to no longer like these [morally questionable] books. I let myself be amused by them” [Letter to Madame de Grignan; July 5, 1671]. As an example of such morally questionable reading, she cites her reading of the works of Rabelais with her son Charles.

e. Philosophical Chronicle

In addition to the presentation of her own philosophical opinions, Sévigné provides a chronicle of the philosophical culture of the salon. Many of her letters describe the Cartesianism and anti-Cartesianism which had become a central feature of the intellectual culture of French salons in the middle of the seventeenth century. An avid reader, Sévigné often confides her reactions to the theories expounded by the fashionable philosophers of the day.

Among her chronicles of Cartesianism is Sévigné’s description of a philosophical debate which occurred in her own Breton home. The disputants weigh the merits of the Cartesian theory of innate ideas against the neo-Aristotelian theory of the role of sensation in the generation of knowledge.

We had here a little tempest of men and of theories and the next day was another scene.  Monsieur de Montmoron, who as you know is quite intelligent, arrived; then there was Father Damaie, who lives only twenty leagues from here; and then my son, whom as you know excels in debate; and then we had some letters from Corbinelli….Monsieur de Montmoron knows your [Madame de Grignan’s] philosophy and contests it on every point. My son defended your father [Descartes]; Damaie was with him and the letters supported him. But three against one wasn’t too strong for Montmoron. He said that we could only have ideas of what had entered our minds through our senses. My son said that we could think independently of our senses: for example, we think what we think [Letter to Madame de Grignan; September 15, 1680].

Typically, Sévigné takes no personal position on the dispute concerning the Cartesian theory of innate ideas, which she faithfully reports. With her usual irony she deflates the philosophical dispute by emphasizing the entertaining (divertissement) nature of the controversy.

Sévigné not only chronicles the Cartesian controversies which characterized her social milieu; her vocabulary is saturated with Cartesian terms. “Innate ideas” (idées innées) echo Descartes’s epistemology; “whirlwinds” (tourbillons) Descartes’s physics; “animal spirits” (esprits d’animaux )Descartes’s biology; “brain traces” (traces dans le cerveau) Descartes’s philosophy of mind. Sévigné’s allegiance to Cartesianism is at best ambiguous.  Her references to her daughter’s passion for Descartes are often ironic. Her philosophy of nature and of religion opposes central Cartesian theories.

A lifelong reader of philosophical works, Sévigné acquired a first-hand grasp of the philosophical controversies of the period through reading the most influential French philosophical authors of the day. Her correspondence alludes to Descartes’s Discourse of Method, Meditations, and Passions of the Soul; Malebranche’s Christian Conversations; and Pascal’s Provincial Letters and Pensées.  But her favored philosophical author was Pierre Nicole (1625-95), a priest closely associated with the Jansenist movement. During Sévigné’s lifetime, Nicole was best known as a moralist for his popular series of Essais morales (1671-78). In twenty-first century philosophy he is best known as the co-author of The Logic of Port-Royal (1662).

It is his presentation of the virtues essential for the Christian life that attracts Sévigné to Nicole. His concept of the virtue of detachment is especially helpful for the acquisition of personal peace.

I find your [Madame de Grignan’s] reflection very good and very right concerning the indifference he [Nicole] wants us to have concerning the approval or disapproval of our neighbors. Like you, I think this requires a little grace and that philosophy alone cannot bring it about. He places peace and union with our neighbor on such a high level and counsels us to acquire this at the expense of so many other things that there is no way after all this that we could be anything but indifferent as to what others think of us [Letter to Madame de Grignan; November 4, 1671].

This detachment from self-concern is the fruit of an austere charity which seeks nothing but the service of one’s esteemed neighbor. In a typically Jansenist note, this peaceful self-possession can only come about through the operation of grace; reliance on philosophical reason alone inevitably falls short.

Another Jansenist trait of Nicole’s theory of virtue lies in his unmasking of natural moral virtues as covers for vice. The declared love of truth in violent philosophical disputes barely conceals the pride and willfulness of the disputants. “What he [Nicole] says about the pride and self-love one finds in all the disputes, which one covers up with the fine name of love of truth, is a point which overwhelms me” [Letter to Madame de Grignan; November 4, 1671]. Rooted in complete submission to the divine will, only the theological virtues can lead the human subject to an authentic moral life. The natural virtues defended by philosophers in their ardent disputes are often little more than the expression of self-interest and self-love.

4. Reception and Interpretation

From the time of the first publication of Madame de Sévigné’s works in the eighteenth century, the reception of her writings has been primarily literary. Literary critics have long analyzed the limpid prose style of Sévigné with its distinctive mix of naturel with vivacité. More historical critics have studied how the letters of Sévigné reflect the society of her time, especially the aristocratic subculture of the salon. Historians have paid special attention to Sévigné’s detailed chronicle of the trial of Fouquet; it constitutes one of the most detailed descriptions of judicial procedure in early modern literature. Sévigné has proved especially influential in subsequent generations of women authors. George Eliot, Elizabeth Gaskell, and Virginia Woolf praised Sévigné as a pioneer of the writing woman.

Twenty-first century commentators have developed a more philosophical analysis of Sévigné’s thought. Lyons in 2011 explores in what sense Sévigné can be classified as a philosophe; Reguig-Naya in 2002 studies the specific link between Sévigné and Descartes and Cartesianism. Several commentators interpret Sévigné’s philosophy from a gendered perspective. Montfort in 2008 employs a feminist angle; Longino Farrell in 1991 uses the category of maternal thinking. Other studies analyze Sévigné’s epistemology (Racevskis, 2002), moral theory (Cartmill, 2001), philosophy of language (Allentuch, 2008), and concept of imagination (Lyons, 2005). Sévigné’s philosophy of nature and theology invite further research.

5. References and Further Reading

All French to English translations above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Sévigné, Marie de Rabutin-Chantal, marquise de. Correspondance, 3 vols.,ed Roger Duchêne.  Paris: Gallimard, 1972-78.
    • Duchêne’s magisterial critical edition of Sévigné’s correspondence has become the edition of reference for scholars.
  • Sévigné, Marie de Rabutin-Chantal, marquise de. Selected Letters, trans. and ed. Leonard Tancock. London: Penguin Books, 1982.
    • Tancock’s popular translation of Sévigné’s letters provides a useful guide to the principal persons cited by Sévigné and who serve as her correspondents.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Allentuch, Harriet R. “Setting Feelings to Words: Language and Emotion in the Letters of Madame de Sévigné,” in Literature Criticism from 1400 to 1800, Vol. 140, eds. T. Schoenberg and L. Trudeau.  Farmington Hills, MI: Thomson Gale, 2008: 205-225.
    • The article explores the link between emotion and linguistic expression in the correspondence.
  • Bernet, Anne. Madame de Sévigné, Mère Passion. Paris: Perrin, 1996.
    • The biography examines the relationship between Sévigné’s personal emotions and her theory of the passions.
  • Cartmill, Constance. “Madame de Sévigné et les maximes du marriage,” Dalhousie French Studies 2001 Fall; 56: 98-107.
    • The article explores the moral positions defended by Sévigné in her counsels on marriage.
  • Duchêne, Roger. Madame de Sévigné, ou, La chance d’être femme. Paris: Fayard, 1982.
    • The book uses a gendered perspective to present the biography of Sévigné.
  • Duchêne, Roger. Naissances d’un écrivain: Madame de Sévigné. Paris: Fayard, 1996.
    • The biography underlines the central stages in the development of Sévigné’s writing.
  • Farrell, Michèle Longino. Performing Motherhood: The Sévigné Correspondence. Hanover, NH: University Press of New England, 1991.
    • This biography explores the various maternal poses adopted by Sévigné in her dealings with her daughter.
  • Lyons, John D. Before Imagination and Embodied Thought from Montaigne to Rousseau. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2005: 122-147.
    • The book’s chapter on Sévigné explores how she used the imagination to deal with various experiences of loss and grief.
  • Lyons, John D. “The Marquise de Sévigné: Philosophe,” in Teaching Seventeenth and Eighteenth-Century Women Writers, ed. Faith Beasely. New York, NY: Modern Language Association of America, 2011: 178-187.
    • The article examines the various ways in which Sévigné can be considered a philosophe.
  • Montfort, Catherine R. “Mme de Sévigné: Seventeenth-Century Feminist?” in Literature Criticism from 1400 to 1800, vol. 140, eds. T. Schoenberg and L. Trudeau. Farmington Hills, MI: Thomson Gale: 114-132.
    • The book chapter approaches Sévigné’s writing from a feminist perspective.
  • Racevskis, Richard. “Time and Ways of Knowing under Louis XIV: Molière, Sévigné, Lafayette,” in Bucknell Studies in Eighteenth-Century Literature and Culture. Lewisburg, PA: Bucknell University Press, 2003: 76-84.
    • The book chapter compares Sévigné’s epistemology with that of her artistic contemporaries.
  • Reguig-Naya, Delphine. “Descartes à la lettre: poétique épistolaire et philosophie mondaine chez Mme de Sévigné,” in Dix-septième siècle 2002: no. 216: 152-171.
    • The article offers a careful analysis of the various ways Cartesian concepts and terms penetrate Sévigné’s vocabulary.


Author Information

John J. Conley
Email: jconley1@loyola.edu
Loyola University Maryland
U. S. A.