Kraft, Victor

Victor Kraft (1880—1975)

Victor KraftVictor Kraft was an Austrian philosopher and librarian. He was, as he himself emphasized, a “non-orthodox” member of the Vienna Circle and tried to reintroduce scientific philosophy in Austria after the Second World War. Beginning in 1903, Kraft argued for epistemology based on ontological realism. He did not claim that realism can be proven logically but is established as an (abductive) inference in order to explain the regularities of perception. In the philosophy of science, he was a proponent of the hypothetico-deductive method. Interestingly, Kraft used a lot of illustrative examples from the sciences and humanities to substantiate his methodological claims. Kraft was the only member of the Vienna Circle who claimed, against logical-empiricist conviction, that an analysis of values and ethics are an appropriate subject for philosophical analysis. Also, he combined insights from empirical sciences (especially psychology) and philosophical analysis in order to provide a non-relativistic basis for morals. From a historical point of view, it is especially remarkable that Kraft published for over seven decades without abandoning his initial position. Of particular importance is his impact on Karl Popper and Paul Feyerabend. His most important works are his Erkenntnislehre (Theory of Knowledge, 1960), his Grundformen der wissenschaftlichen Methoden (The Basic Forms of the Scientific Method, 1925, second edition 1973) and his Foundations for a Scientific Analysis of Value (second German edition 1951, English version published in 1981). He is also known as the author of the seminal monograph The Vienna Circle: the Origin of Neo-Positivism (1951, published in English in 1969).

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Work
    1. Epistemology and Ontology
    2. Philosophy of Science–Methodology
    3. Philosophy of Geography as an Example of Kraft’s Philosophy of Science
    4. Value Theory and Moral Philosophy
  3. Kraft’s Impact as a Philosopher
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Selected Works by Kraft
    2. Quoted Literature and Suggestions for Further Reading

1. Life

Victor (or Viktor) Kraft was born on July 4, 1880 in Vienna, Austria. Both his father and his maternal grandfather were teachers. In 1899, he received the matura (the general qualification for university entrance) and enrolled in geography and history at the University of Vienna with the intention of becoming a teacher. There he attended lectures in economics, geology and botany. Kraft encountered philosophy for the first time as a member of the University of Vienna's Philosophical Society and in private discussion circles. In 1903, Kraft completed his PhD thesis, “The Knowledge of the External World” (Die Erkenntnis der Außenwelt). The following year he studied under Wilhelm Dilthey, Georg Simmel, Carl Stumpf and Heinrich Wölfflin for one semester in Berlin. In 1914, he received the venia legendi, the right to teach at the university level, as a result of his book World-Concept and Knowledge-Concept (Weltbegriff und Erkenntnisbegriff). His supervisors for his “habilitation” were the psychologist and philosopher Friedrich Jodl and the philosopher Alois Höfler. Kraft’s original intention to pursue an academic career was regarded as futile by both Jodl and the philosopher Laurenz Müllner, which led Kraft to seek employment at the University of Vienna library. Though he held a full-time job, in which he ultimately reached the position of national librarian (Generalstaatsbibliothekar), he continued his work in philosophy. In 1924, he applied for a full professorship in Vienna, but for political reasons, the position was given to another candidate (Stadler 2001, 522 ff). Kraft received merely the title of associate professor. In the book he wrote for this application, The Basic Forms of the Scientific Method (Die Grundformen der wissenschaftlichen Methoden), which was published in 1925, Kraft outlined his hypothetico-deductive method. A second, completely revised edition was published in 1973.

In 1924, the Vienna Circle began as an informal discussion group led by the philosopher Moritz Schlick, and Kraft participated at these meetings. He was also a member of the so called Gomperz circle, which was named after its leader, the philosopher Heinrich Gomperz. Kraft never adhered to verificationism, the most radical thesis of the logical empiricists, because it was incompatible with his concept of realism. In 1937, he published Foundations for a Scientific Analysis of Values (Die Grundlagen einer wissenschaftlichen Wertlehre), a book which made early contributions to value theory and ethics. A second edition was released in 1951. In 1938, after the Anschluss (the occupation and annexation of Austria by Nazi Germany), a biographical caesura took place. Kraft was forced to retire due to the fact that he was married to a Jewish woman (Heiß 1993, 139, 157, n. 43; Topitsch 1981, xii). During World War II, he remained in his hometown of Vienna as an “inner emigrant” and wrote a manuscript that was lost in the final days of the war. During this time, he was able to publish in the Swedish journal Theoria. In 1947, he released Mathematics, Logic and Experience, a small volume based on the lost manuscript.

Kraft was finally reinstated as extraordinary professor in 1950, and at the age of seventy he received the title of ordentlicher Professor (full professor) at the University of Vienna. He tried to revitalize a kind of reformed logical empiricist philosophy but was unsuccessful; the political climate at that time was as hostile to logical-empirical philosophizing as it had been in the 1920s and 1930s. He became the academic head of a discussion group of students, which included Paul Feyerabend, who wrote his Ph.D. thesis under Kraft’s supervision. This group was part of the “Forum Alpach”, a non-profit organization that was most important for reintroducing scientific philosophy in Austria and Germany. Feyerabend served as the student leader of this group.

Kraft‘s most significant and mature monograph was published in 1960; the voluminous Theory of Knowledge (Erkenntnislehre) summarized his lifelong philosophical work, and he dedicated the book to himself on his eightieth birthday. Eight years later, he published a small book, The Fundamentals of Knowledge and of Morality (Die Grundlagen der Erkenntnis und der Moral). In 1974, Mathematics, Logic and Experience was reprinted in a substantially revised form. Kraft died on January 3, 1975, in Vienna. For Kraft's biography see Kainz [1976].

2. Work

a. Epistemology and Ontology

The historical and thematic context in which Kraft developed his own philosophical position included the critique of immanence philosophy (a form of neutral monism developed by Richard Avenarius) and Ernst Mach's positivism. Kraft was primarily concerned with defending the assumption of an external world. The Kantian (Critique of Pure Reason, B116) distinction between “question of fact” (quaestio facti) and “question of right” (quaestio iuris) was central for Kraft. In sharp contrast to any form of traditional Kantianism, Kraft did not intend to logically justify any answers to those “questions of right” but instead insisted on pragmatic vindication. This becomes remarkably clear in his attempts to stipulate the concept of knowledge, wherein only by presupposing some ends can an adequate normative definition of the concept of “knowledge” be reached. Kraft presupposes that knowledge must bear practical implications:

The only thing one can do is to make clear why a certain definition of knowledge is chosen, why those traits are regarded as essential for knowledge (Erkenntnis). These are not theoretical but practical claims of validity, which must be seen in the context of other ends, that is, that some consequences are preferred, or that some consequences or presuppositions are rejected (Kraft 1960, 31, my translation).

Later Kraft explains that the concept of knowledge is determined by human nature; that is, only a concept of knowledge that guarantees an invariant order of knowledge can be generally accepted. Human beings need information about the external world; otherwise, no orientation or human actions are possible. Hence, knowledge must be reliable, and it is reliable if it is not chaotic but ordered according to the laws of logic. Pragmatic utility is not enough; knowledge consists of invariant order (Kraft 1968, 17).

The same pattern can be found in his argumentation for a realistic ontology. Kraft states that he does not intend to logically prove the claim for the external world but maintains that the hypothesis of an external world is able to explain any inter- and intrasensual regularity. Examples of intersensual regularities would be: Every time you are served your favourite Indian curry, you recognize its taste and smell; you recognize your cell phone every time it rings. The latter is an example for an intrasensual regularity. In later years Kraft (Kraft 1968, 19) alludes to the infant’s psychological development to stress this point. In earlier years the same point was made without referring to developmental psychology (compare Kraft 1912, 60, 98 174, 181, 183; Kraft 1960, 115). An analogous argument can be constructed concerning the assumption of “other minds” (Fremdseelische). This is an inference to the best explanation. It is, however, not sufficient to simply postulate any explanatory hypothesis; it is also necessary to deduce regular experiential statements from this hypothesis. Kraft claims that his realism has advantages over  positivism because it is a “richer” position: one is able to use it to explain any form of inter- and intrasensual regularity, whereas the positivist must see a sheer miracle in this regularity (compare Kraft 1912, 168). He claims that the assumption of the existence of the external world is a condition for explaining experiential regularity.

It should be noted that Kraft's starting point is the concept of “everyday realism;” it therefore lost some power in light of modern microphysics. As a consequence, he later emphasizes the subject's perception of well-known objects (Kraft 1960, 321 f), such as a measuring instrument’s needle.

Any argument against abductive reasoning can be raised against Kraft. The objection that Kraft's argument begs the question is especially important here; he starts with a realist's assumption and tries to explicate the very same assumption. The skeptic (or positivist) cannot be convinced theoretically, and therefore, Kraft relies on praxis. Here, he turns the tables; it is not the realist who has to justify his claim but the positivist because the latter violates our commonly accepted principles of abductive reasoning.

b. Philosophy of Science–Methodology

Kraft's epistemology cannot be separated from his methodology; his aim is to explicate the epistemological assumptions of any human cognitive practice. Science especially must be emphasized here because it notably fulfills the epistemological requirements mentioned above. It is useful to discuss Kraft's philosophy of science by asking four questions:

  1. What is a (scientific) theory for Kraft?
  2. Why, for Kraft, does any theory have mere hypothetical validity?
  3. How can the theory’s axioms be reached?
  4. How is a theory anchored in experience?

Question 1: What is a (scientific) theory for Kraft?

Kraft adheres to the classical notion of a theory as a “deductive system” (Kraft, 1925, 126; 1960, 369 f). Explanation is deduction from axioms (Kraft 1912, 175). This notion was elaborated by Carl Hempel (see Theories of Explanation, sect. 2).

Question 2: Why, for Kraft, does any theory have mere hypothetical validity?

The answer is simple. Any theory contains sentences of a general nature, for example, “All bodies fall to earth.” This generalization can only be regarded as a hypothesis because it does not follow logically from single instances of falling bodies (problem of induction). This classical, logical uncertainty is supplemented by pragmatic underdetermination. In short, if several aims or concepts of knowledge are possible, as we have seen, how can the correctness of the chosen one be established? Thus, the answers to the first two questions can be conveniently labeled “hypothetico-deductivism.”

Question 3: How can the theory’s axioms be reached?

To begin with, there is an important distinction to keep in mind: “axioms” is Kraft's wording; today, one would use the term “hypotheses”. Kraft's use of words is not modified here for expository reasons. He mentions several times that any deduction is only valid if the axioms are accepted. The axioms are not freely chosen but are accepted on the basis of whether they could fulfill an explanatory task (Kraft, 1925, 157; 1947, 96 f). Given this, a hypothetical system can be established rationally because Kraft argues that the “immanent order of experience” guides the postulation of the axioms (Kraft 1947, 96 f). He claims that this order is sought because it guarantees technical and theoretical control of experiential facts (Erlebnistatsachen). In other words, experience guides the postulation of axioms in an unambiguous manner.

Axioms are postulates. In any kind of scientific research, they are the product of scientific genius and intuition or scintillation. Therefore, they cannot be explained and analyzed further. On the other hand, those very axioms must fulfill a practical task, for example, the explanation of inter- and intrasensual regularities. Immediately the question arises of what explanation consists in, because any set of axioms which does not fulfill its explanatory task cannot be regarded as practically relevant. Consequently, if those axioms in question do not provide the logical starting point for an explanatory deduction of the above mentioned regularities, they must be dismissed as practically irrelevant. Logical deduction, according to Kraft, is the standard form of a (scientific) explanation and science provides knowledge. Therefore, in order to establish the fundamental axioms of any form of (scientific) knowledge, one must refer to a basic or embryonic notion of (scientific) knowledge. In a nutshell, in order to establish knowledge one must already have knowledge. Although Kraft is aware of this so called “circle of epistemology” (a claim made by the German philosopher Leonard Nelson early in 1911, compare Kraft, 1960, 1 ff) his solution is not satisfactory because a conventional fixation of the term in question must be either arbitrary, hence irrational – a solution which is rejected by Kraft – or guided by rational philosophical argumentation. If the latter is the case, one begs the question, assuming that “rationality” is explicated at least partly by (logical) consistency of the propositions in question. This remarkable tension is overlooked by Kraft. The charge of circularity lurks again under the surface of his argumentation because Kraft claims that the axioms are chosen in order to be empirically applicable. However, this is problematic because counter-instances are excluded, and the very idea of falsification of a theory becomes questionable. Experience would lose its power as a corrective instance.

Question 4: How is a theory anchored in experience?

Kraft is an empiricist; that is, he sees the basis of any knowledge-claim in experience. Its foundation lies not in a pure atomistic “sense-datum” or any sensualistic equivalent. Instead, the sense-datum is embedded in an experiential complex that consists of experiential relations (Wahrnehmungsbeziehungen). Moreover, experiential relations are interpreted as signs for external objects. As a consequence, statements about those “external objects” can be tested because any statement about a mind-independent object implies existential statements as logical consequences. Kraft claimed that there is isomorphism between the class of existential statements (implied by the assumption of a mind-independent object) and the experiential regularity. (If there is no table in my room, neither you nor I will be able to perceive it; I will not be able to perceive any intrasensual, intersensual or intersubjective regularity.)

Given tables, flowers and honey bees as ordinary objects, no problems will arise. However, what will happen if electrons, quarks or other highly theoretical entities enter the stage? The layman will perhaps see nothing and will not be able to construct any regularities. To be sure, one is able to learn to “see” those theoretical regularities, but once again, Kraft seems to dismiss the role of dissent in science. He establishes the concept of a “well-known object,” a class of objects about which no dissent might arise. Researcher Miller “sees” electrons, researcher Smith sees another theoretical entity, but both see a screen. (This is a corollary to the idea of the theory-ladenness of observation.) It should be kept in mind, that the term “theory-ladenness” can be understood in two ways (Heidelberger, 2003, 138 f). First, it is the notion that perception is based on expectations and beliefs, hence no “neutral” sense-data is given. Second, “theory-ladennes” is a semantical notion: every (scientific) term gets its meaning through a (scientific) theory. Kraft rejects the second notion, and adheres to the first one: It is a matter of fact that there are no “neutral” sense data. In his earlier years, however, he makes this point without explicitly referring to psychology but admits that the idea of an objective external world is a necessary prerequisite for any rational construction of knowledge.

To summarize, Kraft argued for the assumption of an external world in order to explain perceptual regularities. The empirical basis is equivalent to “experiential relations,” which implies the assumption of the external world. Only because of this is one able to formulate fertile predictions and exclude metaphysical or theistic (pseudo-)explanations. The most important criticism that can be raised against Kraft's attempt is that it is circular: he argued abductively for realism in order to exclude any form of idealism, solipsism or positivism. This maneuver begins with perceived regularities that demand explanation; however, these very regularities are the basis for his empiricist philosophy of science. Kraft rejected any other (pseudo-)explanation of these regularities. He upholds realism as an inference to the best explanation, and in so doing, he was able to formulate a criterion for rejecting non-realistic interpretations of regularity. Hence, his ontology and philosophy of science are entangled, to say the least. This reveals once again that the postulation of axioms cannot be a free decision but is at least partly guided by meta-theoretical considerations and leads quite naturally to Kraft's moral philosophy, especially because the concept of knowledge is regarded as a normative concept.

c. Philosophy of Geography as an Example of Kraft’s Philosophy of Science

Kraft was not only a philosopher; he was also trained in geography. He studied under Albrecht Penck, an outstanding geographer who specialized in physical geography and geomorphology. Penck was influenced by William Morris Davis, an American geographer famous for the “cycle of erosion,” an explicitly deductive theory of geomorphological change. It can be argued that Kraft developed his methodology in part as a result of his association with Penck.

1914 and fifteen years later (1929a), Kraft wrote introductory treatises for students of geography that focused on methodology. As a discipline, geography was (at least in German-speaking countries) in an uncertain state. Is geography a generalizing science or merely descriptive? Is its object the need to simply describe the earth’s surface or should it also tackle the laws governing the changes that take place there, for example as a result of erosion?

Kraft stresses that this “double dualism” is the reason for the not-yet-settled scientific status of geography. The following table illustrates these challenges:

The “double dualism” of geography according to Kraft
Dualism according the epistemological aim of geography (question of right) Dualism according the object of geography (the question of fact)
regional geography (Länderkunde) general geography (Allgemeine Geographie) for example, physical geography; earth's surface as physical object for example, historical geography; earth's surface as humankind’s home
Is the dualism bridgeable? No, because both aims are mutually exclusive. Yes, because both are mutually dependent.

In this conundrum, Kraft took a generally “nomothetical” stance. That is, scientific explanation is deducing singular statements from general laws. Even if the aim is descriptive, some universal laws must be presupposed because every scientific description works with concepts of type. However, this is not the whole story. Kraft sees in abductive inferences to universal laws an important task for general geography (Kraft 1929a, 14). His use of the term “induction” is ambiguous; “abductive” would fit much better, because he did not refer to a merely enumerative induction. Such an “inductive inference” therefore presupposes hypothetical assumptions (Kraft 1925, 250f); only then can universal laws be postulated. These hypotheses can in turn be tested by deducing predictions. To summarize, “induction is not more than postulating a hypotheses and is not an epistemological procedure (Erkenntnisverfahren) on its own” (Kraft 1960, 257).

Description is important too. Descriptive geography presupposes universal laws, whereas general geography presupposes scientific description. The result of Kraft's analysis is that the more fundamental epistemological dualism in geography cannot be bridged because there are two different epistemological aims—generalizing and describing—that cannot be reduced. However, this chasm must not be regarded as an ontological gap. The praxis of geography illustrates that human and physical geography need each other.

Finally, Kraft mentioned a holistic approach that was in fashion during the 1920s. The idea was that a landscape (Landschaft) could be grasped intuitively, much like a work of art is apprehended. According to Kraft, this “third way” is not scientific because a “synthetic approach” lacks any criteria to rationalize the material. Both treaties had some impact. The first (1914) led to a short correspondence between Kraft and the eminent German geographer Alfred Hettner. Fred K. Schaefer used the latter (1929a) to support his critique of Richard Hartshorne, who followed Hettner in some respects.

The “Schaefer-Hartshorne Debate” was the central methodological controversy in geography in the 1950s (compare Martin 1989). It followed the nomothetic-idiographic debate and helped to clarify the scientific status of the study of geography. (Basically, it was the aftermath of the old nomothetic-idiographic controversy.) Kraft developed the idea that any special epistemological status for geography as a science cannot be argued for, which was a straightforward rejection of Hettner's approach. This is not surprising given the main tenets of logical empiricism, but researchers tend to overlook that Kraft came to his conclusion by dwelling on the (Kantian) distinction between “questions of fact” and “questions of right”. As a methodologist, Kraft proposes a unitarian or non-dualistic approach, and as an epistemologist, he refers to different aims of geography; in his view, geography’s basic aims are either individualistic or generalizing. (For further reading, see Radler, 2008.)

Although Kraft’s analysis of geography is of rather special interest for students of (general) philosophy of science, one can show that Kraft’s basic ideas can also be found in his criticism of the Verstehen approach in the humanities (compare Kraft 1929b). An intuitive grasping of a text’s meaning is rejected by Kraft with the same arguments he proposed against the grasping of the “essence” of a landscape. Besides, in his analysis of the methodology of historiography Kraft makes remarkably clear that the former cannot proceed without some nomothetical laws. At least implicitly, the historians have to refer to causal laws or statistical regularities if they aim to explain the behavior of an historical individual or group. The same holds for the philologist who wants to classify a historical document.

d. Value Theory and Moral Philosophy

In his value theory and moral philosophy, Kraft distinguishes between (a) value concepts, (b) value judgments and (c) the rational justification of morals. His Foundations for a Scientific Analysis of Value contains an extensive chapter about the psychology of value judgment.

(a) Value concepts.

Kraft’s primary aim is conceptual clarification and analysis. For example, consider the following statement: “Lassie is a loyal and healthy dog.” The subject Lassie is the bearer of value (Wertträger)—a good. The example can be generalized: a loyal or healthy dog is a good, a bearer of value. The adjectives “loyal” and “healthy” in the statement are value predicates. “Loyalty” and “health” are, according to Kraft, values. Values are the intension (Bedeutungsgehalt) of a value concept. Hence, values designate a general relation to a range of things; a comrade, a friend or a partner can be loyal as well. Thus, the bearer of value may change. In a corollary analysis, Kraft shows that the value concept can be divided into two components. First, it can be divided into a factual component, and second, it can be divided into a normative component (Wertcharakter). (A similar distinction was later made by R. M. Hare.) What does this mean? Consider the value “loyalty.” A loyal friend, comrade or dog may have some factual traits in common. One might argue that a specific form of subservient and respectful behavior might be called “loyal”. These factual traits become more evident if one considers “technical norms;” for example, it is easy to explain what a good tool is. Finally, consider the value “beauty.” Its factual component can be described as a harmonic relationship of the parts of a whole and therein lies its beauty (compare Aesthetics, especially sect. 3). The normative component denotes the value character that, generally speaking, signifies a distinction (Auszeichnung). A loyal dog is preferred over a dog that is disobedient; a masterful painting is preferred over a smearing of paint on a train station’s wall. It is this normative, distinctive component that is essential for value concepts. A large part of Kraft’s analysis consists in describing psychological investigations, or how the subject acquired the value component psychologically.

Valuations do not consist, according to Kraft, in their relation to emotions. Emotions merely cause valuations. An attitude or disposition to these emotions must be added, a normative stance to these emotions must be taken. An analysis of valuation must consider this attitude or disposition but must not be exhausted in the inquiry into emotions or feelings. Therefore, an equation of valuation and emotional affection or disaffection is ruled out. Of course, psychological aspects and problems enter the stage immediately if one analyzes the normative stance to relational feelings or emotions. It becomes clear here that Kraft abandoned the notion of purely semantic and syntactical consideration. Based on his assumptions and his conception of philosophy, it is not possible to analyze valuation without including empirical findings.

(b) Value judgments.

The distinction (Auszeichnung), the essential component of a value concept, can be explained psychologically. Its acquisition is an individual process. However, this is irrelevant in normative considerations because moral philosophy cannot, according to Kraft, be reduced to the description of psychological processes. Value judgments must be impersonal (Kraft, 1981, 129 ff). Kraft distinguishes between value judgments as propositions concerning actual determination of attitudes and value judgments that can be described as imperatives. Value judgments as propositions about actual determination of attitudes would be labeled as descriptive ethics today. The problem is that such a position cannot guarantee objectivity, insofar as moral relativism is regarded as fact:

General human structure as such is not sufficient to determine valuations unequivocally, and given individual differences between evaluations, we cannot in principle exclude the possibility that the same aspect of the same object maybe appraised differently by different persons. (Kraft, 1981, 137).

Kraft therefore offers value judgments as imperatives, as “general guidelines” (Kraft, 1981, 138 ff).

(c) The rational justification of morals.

For this reason, the very problem is that given the empirical findings that guided Kraft’s analysis of values and value judgments, how it is possible to establish an objective (and not merely subjective) moral (compare Kraft 1981, 142 ff)? Is a form of moral relativism not the unavoidable consequence of Kraft’s analysis? From the 1940s on, Kraft began to confront this problem. His main contribution to practical philosophy is an explication of objective morality in a form of the following argument, which can be generalized by substituting “we” for “I” (see also Radler 2010):

I (we) have desires which I am (we are) eager to satisfy.
If I (we) accept morality, I (we) could satisfy my (our) desires.
I (we) accept morality.

Kraft asserts that due to general human organization (allgemein menschliche Organisation), some basic valuations must be valid in every culture (Kraft 1981, 173). In his last monograph, “basic human organization” is not the reference point but rather the (even more vague) concept of “culture”, which is important for an individual’s morality:

Culture is not solely a means to reach happiness, culture is the manner in which humans live. Therefore, culture has to be human’s highest aim, regardless of whether culture makes men happier or not. Humans can only seek to induce happiness through culture” (Kraft, 1968, 141).

Hence, “[culture] is the means, to devise one’s life. Therefore the imperative to guide one’s life through culture is categorical” (Kraft, 1968, 143).

From a social point of view, morality can, according to Kraft, only be instrumentally argued for. He regarded the imperatives of social morality as necessary conditions for reaching aims decreed by human nature.

Kraft was aware of the problems inherent in this kind of reasoning. First, in social morality, only “hypothetical imperatives” can be formulated. The crucial question is how to deal with the apparent plurality of aims and means. Second, it is doubtful whether the conditional sentence in the premises formulates a necessary and sufficient condition. Third, Kraft was criticized because this position is circular; an unspecified moral stance must be taken, and morality is only binding for those who already have accepted its binding force. Kraft is therefore not able to convince those who are “moral outsiders.” His work was an attempt to clarify the cryptic normative inclinations of moral individuals. Kraft’s approach resembles “natural law” positions.

3. Kraft’s Impact as a Philosopher

Looking back one can summarize Kraft’s philosophy as empirically informed (naturalistic), anti-inductivistic, anti-relativistic and – on the other hand – anti-dogmatic. In this way, he is an adherent of “scientific philosophy.” To be more precise, Kraft’s philosophy is remarkable in several aspects: First, “inferences to the best explanations” are scattered throughout the entirety of his work, from epistemology to moral philosophy. Second, Kraft formulates his arguments on the basis of specific empirical findings and a metaphysical (ontological) position. It has also become clear that ontology, epistemology, methodology, value theory and moral philosophy are entangled. At the very center of his philosophical ideas stands the notion that “knowledge” must be regarded as a normative concept. It is this understanding of philosophy, an adherence to prescriptions and not only formal reconstruction, which is central for Kraft.

His bearing on the philosophy of geography was already mentioned. Far more importance seems to be his influence on Karl Popper (compare Schramm 1992, 135f). Popper admits that Kraft can be regarded as a forerunner of his deductivism, however Kraft criticized Popper where the latter argues for a kind of platonistic metaphysics, that is his world 3 (Kraft 1976). Besides this, Kraft criticized Popper’s contribution to the so called “protocol sentence debate”. With his critique of Hugo Dingler, a proponent of conventionalism, Kraft influenced Hans Albert, the leading adherent of Critical Rationalism in Germany. Since the late twentieth century, Kraft’s impact on Paul Feyerabend has been under investigation. It is significant that under Kraft’s guidance a discussion circle of young students in the 1950s in Vienna was established. This circle provided Feyerabend the platform for discussing his PhD-thesis, which is basically a post-war prolongation of the “protocol sentence debate.” Perhaps the most important impact of Kraft’s thinking on Feyerabend is his later admission that philosophy (of science) is empirically informed but basically grounded on pragmatically chosen principles. (The problems of this point were discussed in section 2b above.)

4. References and Further Reading

Most works by Kraft have not been translated into English. The two exceptions are Foundations for a Scientific Analysis of Value (1981) and The Vienna Circle, the origin of neo-positivism; a chapter in the history of recent philosophy (1969). Kraft’s most important works are Erkenntnislehre (Theory of Knowledge) (1960) and Die Grundformen der wissenschaftlichen Methoden (The Basic Forms of Scientific Methods) (1925). The only secondary sources in English are Topitsch (1981), Stadler (2001, 159-161; 666-673) and the review by Feyerabend (1962/1963) of Kraft’s Erkenntnislehre (1960). Kainz (1976) is the standard and still unsurpassed reference to Kraft's life. For a complete bibliography, see Stadler (2001, 667-671) or Frey (1975a and 1975b).

Readers who are familiar with German might consult the following references. Radler (2006, 2008, 2010) provides a historical reconstruction and philosophical analysis of Kraft's philosophy; Vollbrecht (2004)  and Siegetsleitner (2014, 332-386) investigate his moral philosophy. Short and concise overviews are given by Rutte (1973), Frey (1975a and 1976b), Haller (1976) and Schramm (1992). Stadler (2001, 522ff) describes Kraft’s difficulties with securing a professorship in the 1920s. Reininger (1938 [ed.]; compare Stadler, 2001, 158) provides an overview of the “Philosophical Society of the University of Vienna”. Feyerabend (1982, 108f) mentions the Forum Alpbach and Kraft as an important influence. The above mentioned traces of Kraft’s philosophy can – for example –  be found in Feyerabend (1958/1981, 34n; 1960/1999, 42; 1972/1999, 158n). Kraft’s modified Kantian argumentation becomes most visible in his early works (compare Kraft, 1904; 1912). Kraft’s papers on philosophy and methodology of geography are discussed in Radler (2008), where one can also find relevant details and references to secondary literature. Hacohen (2002, 236) describes Popper's friendly relationship to Kraft. Radler (2006), Kuby (2010) and Stadler (2010) focus on his relationship to Popper and Feyerabend. Kraft’s criticism of Dingler and conventionalism can be found in (1947). Kraft discusses aspects of physicalism and phenomenalism in (1969), readers who are interested in the “protocol sentence debate” in general should compare Kraft’s reconstruction with Uebel (2007).

a. Selected Works by Kraft

  • Kraft, Victor (1904), “Das Problem der Aussenwelt.” In Archiv für Philosophie. II. Abt.: Archiv für systematische Philosophie, N.F. X, 269-313.
  • Kraft, Victor (1912), Weltbegriff und Erkenntnisbegriff. Eine erkenntnistheoretische Untersuchung. Leipzig: Johann Ambrosius Barth.
  • Kraft, Victor (1914), “Gegenstand, Aufgaben und Methoden der Geographie als Wissenschaft.” In O. Kende (ed.), Handbuch der geographischen Wissenschaften, 1st part. Berlin: Vossische Buchhandlung [= Sammlung wissenschaftlicher Handbücher für Studierende I], 1-8.
  • Kraft, Victor (1925), Die Grundformen der wissenschaftlichen Methoden. Vienna /Leipzig: Hölder-Pichler-Tempsky A.-G. [= Österreichische Akademie der Wissenschaften, Philosophisch-historische Klasse 203, Abh. 3].
  • Kraft, Victor (1929a), “Die Geographie als Wissenschaft.” In F. Lampe (ed.) Enzyklopädie der Erdkunde, 1st part: Methodenlehre der Geographie. Leipzig / Vienna: Franz Deuticke: 1-22.
  • Kraft, Victor (1929b), “Intuitives Verstehen in der Geschichtswissenschaft.” In W. Bauer (ed.), Mitteilungen des Österreichischen Instituts für Geschichtsforschung, Suplementary Volume XI, Innsbruck: Universitäts-Verlag Wagner, 1-30.
  • Kraft, Victor (1940b), “Über Moralbegründung.” In Theoria 6, 191-226.
  • Kraft, Victor (1947), Mathematik, Logik und Erfahrung. Vienna: Springer.
  • Kraft, Victor (1951/1937), Die Grundlagen einer wissenschaftlichen Wertlehre. 2nd ed. Vienna: Springer.
  • Kraft, Victor (1955), “Der Wissenschaftscharakter der Erkenntnislehre.” In Actes du deuxième congrès international de l'union de philosophie des sciences. Neuchatel: Èditions du Griffon I, 85-94.
  • Kraft, Victor (1960), Erkenntnislehre. Vienna: Springer.
  • Kraft, Victor (1967/1950), Einführung in die Philosophie. Philosophie, Weltanschauung, Wissenschaft. 2nd ed. Vienna / New York: Springer.
  • Kraft, Victor (1968), Die Grundlagen der Erkenntnis und der Moral. Berlin: Duncker & Humblot.
  • Kraft, Victor (1969), The Vienna Circle : the origin of neo-positivism ; a chapter in the history of recent philosophy. - Reprinted. - New York, NY: Greenwood Press.
  • Kraft, Victor (1973/1925), Die Grundformen der wissenschaftlichen Methoden, Vienna: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften [= Österreichische Akademie der Wissenschaften. Philosophisch-historische Klasse 284, Abh. 5]. 2nd ed. Vienna: Verl. d. Österreich. Akad. d. Wiss.
  • Kraft, Victor (1973a), “Konstruktiver Realismus.” In Zeitschrift für allgemeine Wissenschaftstheorie 4, 313-322.
  • Kraft, Victor (1973b), “Gespräch mit Viktor Kraft.” In Conceptus, 7 (21-23), 9-25.
  • Kraft, Victor (1974), “Popper and the Vienna Circle.” In P. A. Schilpp (ed.), The Philosophy of Karl Popper [= Library of Living Philosophers XIV]. La Salle, Ill.: Open Court, 185-205.
  • Kraft, Victor (1976), “Das Universalienproblem.” In B. Kanitscheider (ed.), Sprache und Erkenntnis. Festschrift für Gerhard Frey zum 60. Geburtstag. Innsbruck: Amoe, 33-36.
  • Kraft, Victor (1981), Foundations for a scientific analysis of value. Ed. by Henk L. Mulder. Transl. by Elizabeth Hughes Schneewind. With an introd. by Ernst Topitsch. Dordrecht, Holland [u.a.]: Reidel.
  • Kraft, Victor (1997/1951), Der Wiener Kreis. Der Ursprung des Neopositivismus. 3rd ed. Vienna / New York: Springer.

b. Quoted Literature and Suggestions for Further Reading

  • Feyerabend, Paul (1962/63), “Erkenntnislehre, By Viktor Kraft” [Review], In The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 8, 319-323.
  • Feyerabend, Paul (1981/1958), “An attempt at a realistic interpretation of experience.” In P. K.  Feyerabend, Realism, rationalism and scientific method. Philosophical Papers. Vol. 1, Cambridge et al.: Cambridge University Press, 17-37.
  • Feyerabend, Paul (1982), Science in Free Society. London: Verso.
  • Feyerabend, Paul (1999/1960), “The problem of the existence of theoretical entities.” In P. K. Feyerabend, Knowledge, Science and Relativism. Philosophical Papers Vol. 3. Ed. by John Preston. Cambridge et al.: Cambridge University Press, 16-50.
  • Feyerabend, Paul (1999/1972), “On the limited validity of methodological rules.” In P. K. Feyerabend, Knowledge, Science and Relativism. Philosophical Papers Vol. 3. Ed. by John Preston. Cambridge et al.: Cambridge University Press, 138-181.
  • Frey, Gerhard (1975a), “Logik, Erfahrung und Norm. Zum Tode Victor Krafts.” In Zeitschrift für allgemeine Wissenschaftstheorie 6, 1-6.
  • Frey, Gerhard (1975b), “Nachträge und Ergänzungen zur Bibliographie der Schriften von Victor Kraft.” In Zeitschrift für allgemeine Wissenschaftstheorie 6, 179-181.
  • Hacohen, Malachi Haim (2000), Karl Popper – The Formative Years 1902-1945. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Haller, Rudolf (1976), “Nachruf auf Victor Kraft.” In Zeitschrift für philosophische Forschung 30, 618-622.
  • Heidelberger, Michael (2003), “Theory Ladennes and Scientific Instruments in Experimentation.” In Hans Radder (ed.), The Philosophy of Scientific Experimentation. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 138-151.
  • Heiß, Gernot (1993), “... wirkliche Möglichkeiten für eine nationalsozialistische Philosophie? Die Reorganisation der Philosophie (Psychologie und Pädagogik) in Wien 1938 bis 1940.” In Kurt R. Fischer & F, M. Wimmer (eds.), Der geistige Anschluß. Philosophie und Politik an der Universität Wien 1930-1950. Vienna: WUV-Universitätsverlag, 130-170.
  • Kainz, Friedrich (1976), “Viktor Kraft [Nachruf].” In Almanach für das Jahr 1975 [der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften], 519-557.
  • Kuby, Daniel (2010), "Rational zu sein war damals für uns eine Lebensfrage." Studien zu Paul Feyerabends Wiener Lehrjahren. Diploma thesis, University of Vienna.
  • Martin, Geoffrey (1989), “The Nature of Geography and the Schaefer-Hartshorne Debate.” In J. N. Entrikin & S. D. Brunn (eds.), Reflections on Richard Hartshorne's The Nature of Geography,Washington, DC: Assoc. of American Geographers 69-89.
  • Radler, Jan (2006), Victor Krafts konstruktiver Empirismus. Eine historische und philosphische Untersuchung. Berlin: Logos.
  • Radler, Jan (2008), “Victor Kraft und die Geographie.” In M.Fürst et al. (eds.), Analysen, Argumente, Ansätze. Beiträge zum 8. Internationalen Kongress der Österreichischen Gesellschaft für Philosophie in Graz, II. Frankfurt (Main): Ontos, 65-75.
  • Radler, Jan (2010), “Abduktive Argumentationsformen in Krafts Moraltheorie.” In A. Siegetsleitner (ed), Logischer Empirismus, Werte und Moral. Eine Neubewertung. Vienna / New York: Springer, 157-176.
  • Reininger, Robert (1938, ed.), “50 Jahre Philosophische Gesellschaft an der Universität Wien 1888-1938.” Vienna: Verlag der Philosophischen Gesellschaft an der Universität Wien.
  • Rutte, Heiner (1973), “VIKTOR KRAFT. Eine philosophische Standortbestimmung.” In Conceptus 7, 5-8.
  • Schramm, Alfred (1992), “Viktor Kraft: Konstruktiver Realismus.” In J. Speck (ed.), Die Grundprobleme der großen Philosophen. Philosophie der Neuzeit, VI (Tarski, Reichenbach, Kraft, Gödel, Neurath). Göttingen: Vandenhoek & Ruprecht, 110-137.
  • Siegetsleitner, Anne (2014), Ethik und Moral im Wiener Kreis Zur Geschichte eines engagierten Humanismus. Vienna / Cologne / Weimar: Böhlau.
  • Stadler, Friedrich (2001), The Vienna Circle. Studies in the Origins, Development, and Influence of Logical Empiricism. Wien / New York: Springer.
  • Stadler, Friedrich (2010), “Paul Feyerabend and the Forgotten ‘Third Vienna Circle’.” In F. Stadler (ed.), Vertreibung, Transformation und Rückkehr der Wissenschaftstheorie. Vienna /Berlin / Münster: Lit, 169-189.
  • Topitsch, Ernst (1981), “Introduction” In Victor Kraft, Foundations for a Scientific Analysis of Value, ed. by Henk Mulder. Dordrecht / Boston / London: Reidel [Vienna Circle Collection 15], xi-xvii.
  • Uebel, Thomas (2007), Empiricism at the Crossroads. The Vienna Circle’s Protocol-Sentence Debate. Chicago / La Salle, Ill.: Open Court.
  • Vollbrecht, Oliver (2004), Victor Kraft: rationale Normenbegründung und logischer Empirismus: eine philosophische Studie. Munich: Utz.

Author Information

Jan Radler
European University Viadrina Frankfurt (Oder)

Bacon, Roger: Language

Roger Bacon: Language

Western medieval philosophers and theologians spent a great deal of effort thinking about the nature of language. Notwithstanding their debt to their ancient forerunners, authors like Peter Abelard, Boethius of Dacia, and William of Ockham contributed a wide variety of innovative ideas and theories to the field of linguistics. During the time of the so-called ‘modern logic,’ the work of Roger Bacon (1214/20 —1292) is particularly noteworthy. He worked in this area from the beginning of his professional career (as a Master of Arts in Paris in the 1240’s) until the end of his life (in the Franciscan convent in Oxford). He left behind a prodigious amount of research, much of which still awaits critical examination. Bacon’s work in the field of language is also remarkable with respect to the wide range of themes and issues he covered. In his work, he either extensively covered or at least touched on issues representing the whole of the disciplines of the Trivium (grammar, dialectic, rhetoric), spanning from speculative grammar and semantics to semiotics and evolutionary linguistics. In his linguistic work, however, Bacon was primarily interested in practical ends, in the ways in which the study of language can aid in matters of divine and human wisdom. While many of his writings were composed with an eye towards theological questions such as biblical exegesis, he also considered pedagogical, ethical and political aspects of language, such as how language can be used to convert infidels or provide moral order for society.

In his work on language, Bacon would oftentimes present unorthodox positions. His semantic theory on univocal appellation and his emphasis on the importance of metaphor and the intention of the speaker in everyday communication – the so-called ‘pragmatic approach’ – distinguish him from many of his contemporaries. In addition, Bacon is probably the most important medieval theorist of signs, laying out a comprehensive classification of signs as well as a conception of signification and linguistic signs. Here as well he espoused an uncommon view. According to Bacon, a sign is essentially a relational thing, dependent on the relation between sign and sign-interpreter. Moreover, Bacon’s work on semiotics is notable for his insistence that things rather than their concepts are the principal significates of words. Together with the work of Dante Alghieri (1265-1321), Bacon’s work on language stands out in virtue of his observations on the evolution of languages. Lastly, Bacon’s linguistic work is noteworthy in virtue of his having stated the basic principle of universal grammar, that is, the principle that there is only one grammar for all languages.

This article gives an overview of Bacon’s contributions to the study of language. It focuses on Bacon’s intentionalist approach in speculative grammar, as well as his contributions to the fields of semantics, semiotics, evolutionary linguistics and universal grammar. Lastly, it considers some of Bacon’s considerations concerning pedagogical aspects of languages.

Table of Contents

  1. General Remarks
    1. Bacon’s Division of the Trivium
  2. Speculative Grammar
    1. Bacon’s Method in Speculative Grammar
    2. Bacon’s Intentionalism
  3. Logical Semantics
    1. Bacon’s Doctrine of the Production of Speech
    2. Bacon’s Doctrine of Univocal Appellation
  4. Semiotics and Semantics
    1. General Remarks
    2. The Definition of Sign and Signification
    3. The Classification of Signs
    4. Semantic Analyses within a Semiotic Context: Imposition, Analogy, and Connotation
  5. Languages
    1. Language Groups and Functions
    2. Bacon’s Formulation of the Universal Principle of Grammar
    3. Philology within Bacon’s Program for the Reform of Learning
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. 1240’s-1250’s
      2. 1250’s-1268: Papal Opera
      3. 1268-1292
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. General Studies on Medieval Theories of Language
      2. On Roger Bacon’s Philosophy of Language

1. General Remarks

For several reasons, the medievals devoted much effort to the development of the skills necessary for the interpretation of texts. One reason for this was that knowledge in secular and divine matters predominantly came from books, which oftentimes needed to be translated and always required explanation and interpretation. Another reason was that medieval learning was essentially a commentary tradition, with most of the writings being commentaries on what were taken to be canonical texts (for example, the Scriptures or the works of Aristotle). In common with his fellow-logicians and grammarians, Bacon attached great value to issues pertaining to the disciplines of the Trivium (grammar, logic, and rhetoric), and he contributed to many important areas such as semantics, semiotics, and philology as well as to the question of the place of language studies within institutions of higher learning and society as a whole.

The emphasis these authors placed on logical, semantic, grammatical, and syntactic questions was in part due to the fact that after the end of Antiquity of all the branches of ancient philosophy, logic, grammar, and rhetoric remained on the agenda in secular as well as theological discussions. The particular emphasis that Bacon placed on the study of speech and languages, though, was not only theoretical. His interest in understanding language and mastering foreign languages like Hebrew and Greek was also motivated by his belief in the eminent practical importance of the study of speech and language for (1) ecclesiastical functions, (2) the reform of knowledge, (3) the conversion of infidels, and (4) the battle against the Antichrist.

During Bacon’s time, the scope of philosophical material increased considerably due to the translation of textbooks previously unavailable in Latin. The Aristotelian Organon together with the Metaphysics, Physics, and On the Soul (among other works) turned out to be a fruitful source of inspiration which triggered the development of a wide and complex variety of debates and approaches towards solving problems of many kinds. Many of the problems surrounding logic and language dealt with fallacies of equivocation. Grammatical discussions about semantics favoring a contextual approach to reference were connected to the logical problem of equivocation and thereby formed the high point (1175-1250) of a movement called “terminism” (and the approach called logica moderna or “terminist logic”), so called because of the emphasis on terms and their properties. This theory of the properties of terms – such as supposition, appellation, ampliation, and restriction – was the foundation of medieval semantic theory. Within this framework (and in particular, within the context of the controversial debates between Parisian and Oxford logicians), Bacon developed his own, sometimes original ideas on reference, meaning, and equivocation. The controversies between the Oxford and Parisian traditions on the various properties of terms remained an important point of reference for Bacon to which he returned in various writings. His writings on logical and semantic questions spanned different literary genres (including for example university textbooks and independent treatises), and his solutions to these problems are therefore scattered in many works. The fact that Bacon more or less consistently devoted himself to the study of logic and grammar over a period of almost fifty years demonstrates how important Bacon considered these debates to be (especially in relation to theology and religion in his later works).

In his work on linguistic and philological matters one can distinguish between two different stages. In the first stage are included Bacon’s contributions to the problem of universal quantification in the Summa de Sophismatibus et Distinctionibus (SSD), and to semantic problems revolving around the properties of terms in the Summulae Dialectices (SD); in particular the problem of univocal appellation and predication in regards to what are called ‘empty classes.’ Bacon’s solutions (especially to the semantic problems) provide the theoretical background against which Bacon continued to develop his doctrines during the second stage of his work on logic and linguistic matters. In this second stage, represented by the De Signis (DS) and the Compendium Studii Theologiae (CST), Bacon’s reflections on analogy were noteworthy as were his theories on the imposition of signs and, related to this, on the definition and classification of signs. The DS contains material on semiotics that was originally a part of the third part of the Opus Maius (“On the Utility of the Study of Language”), and that was discovered only recently and edited in 1978. The application of Bacon’s semiotics to theology, though – in which he intended to study sacraments as signs – remains lost. The CST represents a later adjustment of the material brought forth in the DS.

a. Bacon’s Division of the Trivium

Generally speaking, Bacon’s understanding of the nature and division of the disciplines of the Trivium (grammar, dialectic or logic, rhetoric) was quite different from that of his contemporaries and in certain respects richer. According to Bacon, rhetoric belongs to moral philosophy in that it represents the part of the practical branch of moral philosophy that is concerned with putting moral philosophy into practice: he considered rhetoric to be the art of speaking in such a manner that would motivate people to act morally. Bacon subordinated grammar to music (For Bacon’s views on music see van Deusen, 1997). Furthermore, grammar was not restricted to the study of the then-classical works on grammar by Priscian or Donatus; in Bacon’s view, grammar should first encompass the traditional elementary teaching of Latin, should then proceed to the study of the universal principles of language – a genre called ‘speculative grammar’ – and should eventually culminate in the mastery of languages, especially the languages of the Bible. Lastly, Bacon’s understanding of the place and nature of logic also differed from that of his contemporaries. Despite Bacon’s notoriety for his invectives against the “sins” infesting university studies – among which he included logic – Bacon still recommended a certain kind logic to be practiced. More specifically, according to Bacon, because there is no need for a science which treats of and teaches the rules of rational argumentation (and which, in virtue of this role, should occupy an eminent rank among the sciences) largely because logic is a basic capacity that is innate to humans, consisting in the ability to think rationally and to make arguments. In short, logic, according to Bacon, is not the “science of sciences” but rather a basic capability that needed to be made explicit rather than taught. Contrary to his contemporaries (including William of Sherwood, for example, who regarded logic to be a normative discipline that taught veritable speaking and helped to avoid false speaking), Bacon conceived logic to be a descriptive discipline. Logic, according to Bacon, makes explicit and describes the formal rules of argumentation that we already use (OT, ch. xxviii, 102f.). This explains why Bacon, in his works on logic, did not practice logic under the aspect of formal reasoning. Instead, he practiced logic under the aspect of its potential for solving problems arising from fallacies by emphasizing the role of context (“contextual approach”). In particular, Bacon was interested in the fallacy of equivocation and examined it extensively in his De Signis and Compendium Studii Theologiae.

2. Speculative Grammar

One of the accomplishments of medieval grammarians was to have significantly extended the original scope of the disciplines represented in the canonical works on grammar by Priscian and Donatus. Within the University setting, grammar along with other philosophical disciplines was expected to meet the requirements of Aristotelian science, which called for an identification of universal and necessary features of language that could become the subject of a scientific grammar. Grammar was thus considered to be a scientific and speculative, that is, theoretical endeavor: its goal was not only to teach the Latin language or to engage in literary analysis of Latin language and literature, but, in addition, to explain the nature and organization of language in terms of its causes and universal features within a purely theoretical framework (hence the name theoretical or ‘speculative grammar’). From a historical point of view, though, the Latin name grammatica speculativa was used exclusively by and for the ‘modist’ grammar of the late thirteenth and fourteenth centuries (called ‘modist’ because of the central role of the concept of the way or mode of signification – modus significandi – of this grammatical and semantic theory). The standard name for this theory today is ‘modism.’

Bacon wrote on speculative grammar – yet not always approvingly.Although during his time as Parisian Master of Arts Bacon formulated an intentionalist grammar – ‘intentionalist’ because Bacon emphasized the role of the signifying intention of the speaker (intentio proferentis) in answer to the question of the causes of language – he did not approve of the fully developed modistic doctrine of meaning which held that changes of meaning are imported by features based on the grammatical categories of nouns, verbs, cases, or tenses. Bacon preferred to explain all differences of meaning as cases of equivocation and he emphasized the importance the context had for the meaning of an utterance (DS, §§143-161; see Fredborg, 1981). As far as the study of the causes of language was concerned, the later Bacon very explicitly excluded grammar from any consideration of its principles and causes, and delegated their investigation to metaphysics and music instead. In his Opus Maius, Bacon delegated the study of causes and principles to music, and in his Opus Tertium he stated that “The grammarian is to the musician as the carpenter is to the geometer,” in the sense that the grammarian described the phenomena of the length and accents of letters and syllables which the musician studied from a causal perspective (OT, ch. lix, 231).
Despite these comments, Bacon’s early statements about grammar suggest that Bacon was himself a proponent of speculative grammar, at least originally. His earliest involvement with grammatical issues was in his early work Summa Grammatica (SG). The SG was a work typical for the Parisian arts faculty insofar as it was a supplement to the mandatory commentaries on one of the traditional canonical texts on grammar: Priscian’s Institutiones Grammaticae. More specifically, the SG is a supplement to commentaries on Priscian Minor and therefore deals with the principles of the “construction” of sentences (that is, the principles of syntax), by using sophismata (puzzling, odd or difficult sentences) as examples. The three parts of the SG represent rules and principles determining common and figurative sentence constructions, non-figurative constructions as well as adverbial constructions and liturgical formulae. In composing the SG, Bacon was deeply indebted to the most famous of the commentaries on Priscian Minor, that of his English colleague Robert Kilwardby (d. 1279) from whom he copied a considerable amount of content almost to the letter.

a. Bacon’s Method in Speculative Grammar

As was typical for speculative grammarians of that time, Bacon’s approach in the SG is guided by a principle taken from Aristotle’s Physics according to which “art imitates nature to the extent that it can” (Physics, II 2, 194 a21; SG 35, 4). Thus, within the context of the causal analysis of linguistic construction, grammatical art (re-)defines its own principles by beginning with nature. What this principle meant for Bacon’s analysis of syntactical function was that he, under the supposition that the process of constructing words was parallel to physical movement, studied grammatical construction alongside Aristotle’s analysis of movement in the fourth book of the Physics (Physics, IV 11, 219 4a21). Since a moving object, according to Physics, is moved from something (terminus a quo or principium) to something (terminus ad quem), so, in parallel manner, the verb of a sentence, signifying action and movement, needed two terms, a beginning from which it started and an end toward which it moved (SG, 65, 78). A grammatical category (like a case) was understood to be a property of an expression that allows it to function as a term of movement. Furthermore, Bacon laid out some very general rules for the combination of grammatical categories. In accordance with the principle that “nothing which is in movement can come to rest in something in movement, no movement being able to complete itself in something in movement,” Bacon deduced the argument why neither the participle nor the infinitive can occupy the function of the subject. The reason, according to Bacon, is that the character of both participle and infinitive is, by their verbal signification, too ‘unstable’ to function as a subject (SG, 60, 62). Bacon used a similar approach in regard to the topic of the organizing principle for the combination of terms. Take, for example, the dependence between adjective and its substantive: here the corresponding physical principle was that of dependence, in this particular case, between the accidental with regard to its subject (SG, 134, 143). However, as Bacon emphasized, art did not imitate nature in an absolute way but only “to the extent it can.” This meant that in those cases in which the physico-grammatical parallel reached its limits (in the sense that one ran into divergences in function), the grammarian needed to redefine the scope of this parallelism. The consequence of the limitations of the physico-grammatical parallel was that grammarians like Bacon sought inspiration regarding the functioning of grammar not only from the physical world but also from logic and other philosophical areas like epistemology.

b. Bacon’s Intentionalism

In regard to the analysis of the causes of linguistic construction, one other explanatory element arose from the realization of the role of the speaker, namely, the intention motivating a particular grammatical construction. Bacon shared this so-called intentionalist approach to grammar with many of his contemporaries, most notably with Robert Kilwardby. Generally speaking, Bacon’s analysis of linguistic construction and especially his adoption of the intentionalist approach in the SG was more or less common practice at that time. The principles of grammatical construction, according to the intentionalists, cannot be mechanically deduced from an application of rules alone; rather, one has to consider a voluntarist element in the form of the signifying intention of the speaker. According to Bacon, the truth value of a statement does not depend exclusively on its conformity with grammatical rules but, to an equal degree, on its adequateness with its signifying intention. In cases in which the speaker wishes to signify some particular idea, she is legitimately allowed to distance herself from the normal rules as for example in figurative speech, metaphors, or elliptic sentences: “It is not the sign which signifies but rather the speaker by means of the language – in the same way that it is not the stick which hits but he who uses it” (SSD, 153f.). In those ‘authorized’ variations in which statements do not conform to common usage (like in figures of speech), something is needed in order for them to be acceptable: namely, a legitimate justification in regard to a “reason which makes it possible” and a “reason which makes it necessary” (SG, 68, 133). Thus, the notion that language functions according to rules is found in both the common construction of sentences following normal rules and in the variations that are the result of the conscious and voluntary acts of a speaker (for a detailed account of Bacon’s and Kilwardby’s intentionalism see Rosier, 1994).
The later Bacon applied the above mentioned elements – (1) the intentionalist analysis of language and (2) the conception of language as an instrument for humans – in the context of his treatment of the (magical) power (potestas verborum) of spoken words. In his Opus Maius IV as well as his Opus Tertium and his Moralis Philosophia, Bacon was concerned with the issue of the “utility of grammar,” specifically, the issue of how spoken language works and is able to affect a listener’s soul. In addition to conceiving of the power of words as a physical process – along the doctrine of the multiplication of species (discussed below) – Bacon considered the intention of the speaker (among other elements) as an important factor in communication (OT, ch. xxvi, 96). Bacon utilized he principle of the rule-governed nature of language later in the semantic analyses he conducted in writings like the De Signis.

3. Logical Semantics

Recent research has begun to recognize the actual nature and extent of Bacon’s contributions to the field of semantics. Almost all of his writings in this field displayed originality to varying degrees, be that in the form of substantive solutions or in his approach toward the material. In his Summa de Sophismatibus et Distinctionibus (SSD), for example, Bacon contributed an important twofold thesis: first, a spoken statement had to be understood as a carrier of such information as was necessary for a listener to interpret it in a way that was in accordance with the speaker’s intention of conveying sense, and second, that the information contained in a sentence and the linguistic form it was presented in (especially the sequence of words) was sometimes not only insufficient but even an obstacle to a listener’s interpretation and the speaker’s intention (see Rosier and de Libera, 1986).

a. Bacon’s Doctrine of the Production of Speech

In his SSD Bacon challenged the semantic doctrine of “natural sense.” This doctrine was commonly held among 13th century logicians and revolved around the concept of “inclusion” (inclusio). The concept of inclusion was used in order to solve semantic problems arising from sentences containing several syncategorematic terms (‘all’ and ‘if,’ for example), or universal quantifiers. Sentences such as “omne animal est rationale vel irrationale” (“Every animal is rational or irrational”) allowed for two different interpretations. To decide whether what was meant was “Every animal is rational or every animal is irrational,” or “Every animal is rational or irrational,” Bacon’s fellow logicians argued that it was the sequence of words (ordo prolationis) in a sentence that contains the necessary semantic information. Bacon, however, chose a different strategy on how to solve the problem of universal quantification; he countered with his doctrine of the “production of speech” (generatio sermonis): it was not, as other logicians believed, that “the logical structure of sentences was contained in the linear sequence of the components of the sentence”; rather, as Bacon emphasized, it was necessary to consider the threefold division of the dimension linguistic communication: (1) the freedom of speaker and listener, (2) the nature of spoken language, and (3) restrictions of communication. Thus, in his argument against the doctrine of “natural sense,” Bacon stressed the relationship between the speaker and the listener. By taking into account the linguistic form chosen by the speaker and the sense provided by the listener, Bacon contributed the important consideration that decoding semantic information was interpretation: “In order to arrive at the intention of the speaker (intentio proferentis) it is necessary to bring in the concept of the production of speech (generatio sermonis).”

b. Bacon’s Doctrine of Univocal Appellation

Among some of Bacon’s other main contributions in the field of semantics was his insistence on the freedom of the will and the role of the speaker in the process of naming. Bacon put forward the notion that the significatory function of words is constituted through a relation to an external object rather than through a connection with a concept or representation in the mind of the speaker: Bacon considered things to be the significates of words rather than concepts – nowadays, this would have made him an externalist in semantics. In this context, Bacon advanced a unique doctrine in regard to the problem of equivocation, namely that by themselves names are names only of presently existing external things. He subsequently applied this theory to two issues: the first one was on inferences involving infinite, privative, and negative terms and the second issue was about the existential condition of the significates of names (the latter issue marked a recurring theme in Bacon’s scholarship) (see de Libera, 1981).
Bacon began his lifelong study of the problem of univocal appellation in his Summulae Dialectices when he criticized what was then considered to be the conventional wisdom on the matter: the view that it is possible to apply terms univocally to being and non-being – a theory called “natural supposition” (suppositio naturalis). In arguing against this theory, Bacon referred to the notion that being and non-being as well as the present and the past have nothing in common that would warrant the use of one and the same term – a notion that was strengthened by the fact that Bacon could point towards the authoritative support of Aristotle’s Metaphysics. “Some say that a term names present, past, and future things by itself, and that it is common to being and non-being. Others [though] say that a term is a name for present things only, and [that] nothing is common to being and non-being or the past, the present, and the future, according to what Aristotle states in the first book of Metaphysics” (SD, §§526-527). In his objection against the theory of natural supposition, Bacon focused his attention on the term ‘supposition’ and in his solution even resorted to grammatical concepts. While the Parisians, who argued in favor of natural supposition, believed that a term ‘supposited’ for all present, future, and possible entities outside the sentence, which in turn then constituted a term’s extension, Bacon pointed towards a term’s meaning and its original imposition (impositio) and held that supposition was to be understood as being in a sentence and, taken by itself, being restricted to present entities. Now although, according to Bacon, a term by itself (de se) could only concern those named in the present and although, in contrast, the past and the future were named only passingly, the term still could, as Bacon phrased it, be “extended” to include the past and the future through the verb’s tense. Thus, where the Parisians spoke of natural supposition and restriction (restrictio), Bacon’s response was to deny natural supposition and restriction and to affirm supposition for present entities (suppositio de se pro praesentibus) and ‘widening’ (ampliatio). Thus, from a more general point of view, Bacon’s doctrine of appellation was grounded in the distinction between two semantic perspectives: from a grammatical point of view (that of construction), and from a logical point of view (that of meaning). In other words, under the logical aspect, a noun only applies to present and existent entities, while under the grammatical aspect of a noun’s actual construction in a sentence (nomen constructionis) in combination with a verb, a noun could stand for past or future, that is, non-existent things. Hence, according to Bacon, it is the function of the verb in a sentence to establish a semantic relation to things past and future; verbs extend the supposition of nouns beyond their original imposition to present, existent entities. Verbs in present tense, however, do not contribute to the subject’s semantic relation to present, existent things since terms already possess this relation by themselves (SD, §§559-560).

4. Semiotics and Semantics

a. General Remarks

Roger Bacon was probably the most important theorist of signs in the medieval period, and his two semiological treatises, De Signis (DS) and the Compendium Studii Theologiae (CST), are among the most extensive semiotic treatises from this period. Generally speaking, his semiotics encompasses the definition and classification of signs (that is, modes in which a sign signifies or occurs), a theory of signification (including univocal, equivocal and analogical signification), as well as accounts of imposition and the so-called ‘semiotic triangle’ (a semiotic model that illustrates the relation between signs, concepts, and things). In a theoretical perspective, the three most prominent features of Bacon’s theory of signs are the semantics integrated into his classification of signs (and here especially his conception of natural signs), the notion of connotation (consignificatio) as a type of analogy, and his theory of imposition (impositio: the act of name-giving) (see Maloney, 1983a and 1984).
Many of the theses which Bacon defended in the DS (written around 1267) and the CST (written around 1292) involved the resumption of themes which he first introduced in his earlier writings on logic. By contrast, his semiotic works were neither a repetition nor a simple updating of older thoughts; rather, they contained contributions which responded to the debates going on at the respective times. In fact, Bacon remarked rather explicitly in DS that the lack of a theory of the imposition of words for signification (and the lack of a theory of the mechanics of signification) urged him to write the DS, in which the development of a theory of semantics (the signification of words – “signa quae significant ad placitum”), within a carefully developed semiotics, was the goal, and which was supposed to fill gaps and remedy errors in the logical and grammatical literature at that time (DS, §16, 86). In regard to his fellow sign theorists, Bacon deviated in many important points from the common opinions – for example, in regard to the issue of whether what should be considered essential for a sign’s existence was the relation of the sign to the intellect for whom it signified or the relation of the sign to what is signified, Bacon opted for the second answer – which, in many aspects, makes Bacon’s ideas on signs and semantics quite radical.
It should also be noted that Bacon intended both the DS and the CST to be considered from the point of view of theological application. A summary in Bacon’s Opus Tertium (OT, ch. xvii, 100-102) reveals that the DS must have contained a section about the application of the theory of signs to theology. As far as the CST is concerned, it was a treatise explicitly dealing with the reform of theological studies, in which Bacon summons the reader to turn towards the Scriptures and to investigate how signs are signified there – that is to say, to apply the theoretical section on semiotics and semantics to theological material (CST, §1, 32 and § 83, 82). It is commonly held that in both texts Bacon tried “to construct a general semantic and semiological doctrine on the basis of a tradition both theological and ‘artistic,’” or, in other words, to combine the two main semiotic traditions in the Middle Ages: Aristotelian semantics and Augustinian semiotics (Rosier-Catach, 1997, 98). Some interpreters have presented Bacon’s accomplishments in an even more pronounced form; they have said that Bacon’s concern with semiotics and semantics was directed at philosophical and theological ends, namely to improve scientific practice (which was mainly grounded in textual analysis) in both faculties. The instrument which Bacon thought should be used in order to achieve that goal was a semantic and semiotic analysis of language: an inquiry into the ways in which language worked, or did not work. His approach to philosophical and theological studies led some scholars to attribute an “analytic orientation” to Bacon’s reform efforts, which were ultimately directed at benefitting the whole of Christendom (De Libera, 1997, 120f; Perler, 2005).

b. The Definition of Sign and Signification

Bacon defined sign as “that, which offered to the senses or the intellect designates something to that intellect, because not every sign is offered to the senses as the common description assumes, but some [that is, mental concepts – passiones animae] are offered solely to the intellect […] therefore, they [mental concepts] are offered only to the intellect, [and] in this way they represent the external things themselves to that intellect” (DS, §2, 82). This view was a minority opinion in the thirteenth century in the sense that sign theorists commonly held an Augustinian, intensional definition of signs: the sign (a spoken phrase for example) stood for the thoughts of the speaker, which the sign’s recipient received through the senses which in turn represented it to the intellect. In writing that a sign was something that upon being “offered to the senses or the intellect represents itself to that intellect, since not every sign is offered to the senses,” Bacon meant that mental concepts themselves (passiones animae) were signs of things, which represented external things to the respective intellect. In other words, Bacon considered concepts as signs of the objects (DS, §166, 134). In the case of linguistic signs, spoken words for example, this meant that in accordance with the act of imposition – analogous to that of Baptism – words immediately referred to the things themselves.
A sign, according to Bacon, is in the category of relation “and is uttered essentially in reference to the one for whom it signifies” (DS, §1, 81). Signification, according to Bacon, entails four elements: the agency giving the sign, the sign itself, the significate (the thing a sign signifies), and the sign-interpreter. A sign was commonly considered to be a triadic relation (in the category relation), in regards to which the question arose regarding which of these relations was essential for the notion of a sign: the relation to the significate or to the sign-interpreter? The majority of theologians held that the primary relation of a sign is that to the thing signified and they thought this relation to be essential for the sign. In opposing Bonaventure’s (d. 1274) position (and that of other theologians of his time), Bacon reversed traditional opinion when he emphasized the priority of the ‘pragmatic’ relation of the sign to the sign-interpreter over the secondary relation to the significate (the thing signified): “Because if no one could conceive something through a [given] sign, it would be void and in vain, in fact, it wouldn’t be sign […] like the essence of the father remains when the son is dead, yet not the relation of fatherhood.” For a sign to be a sign it was required, according to Bacon, that it had an interpreter; the relation to the significate was secondary because ‘to signify’ is a relation, essentially and principally related to the one receiving the sign because it would be incorrect to infer that because “the sign is in act” that the significate is also in act, for nonentities can be signified by words just like entities” (DS, §1, 81f). Thus, signification is a relation established through communication to an interpreter: A wreath made of wine leaves above a tavern is only potentially a sign if nobody is there to interpret it as such and thereby render it actually a sign. This account also meant that the first relation of a sign (to the interpreter) determines the second relation (to the significate) which has consequences for the sign’s signification in the sense that it stresses the freedom of the one giving the sign with regard to its signification (see Maloney, 1983b and Rosier-Catach, 1997, 91-98).

c. The Classification of Signs

In the CST Bacon stated that he independently (per studium propriae inventionis) worked out the division between natural and given signs in his DS; and that, when he subsequently came across Augustine’s division in the second book of De Doctrina Christiana, he found it to be identical with his own (CST, §25, 56). In recent literature there has been considerable debate as to the degree of Bacon’s actual indebtedness to Augustine’s semiotics in the De Doctrina Christiana. Now even if Bacon was familiar with Augustine’s classification at the time he wrote the DS, it is clear that he did not simply copy it. Rather than to simply do this, Bacon integrated several sign typologies, including those from Augustine as well as from Aristotle and from theories of the sacramental sign, and this is precisely where his merit lies. For example, in the diagram given below, the first principal distinction between groups (I) and (II) corresponds to the De Doctrina Christiana, and groups (I.1-2) are of Aristotelian origin, with group (I.1) coming from the Analytics and Rhetorics, and group (I.2) coming from On Interpretation and On the Soul.
The division of signs proposed by Bacon in the opening paragraphs of DS is best represented schematically:
Signs (signa)

natural signs
signifiying by their own nature
(signa naturalia ex essentia sua)

given signs
sign from a soul
(signa ordinata ab anima, ex intentione animae recipiens rationem signi)
(I. 1) signifying necessarily or with probability because of inference, concomitance, consequence

(I.1.1) with regard to the past
(I.1.1.1) necessarily: having milk as a sign of motherhood
(I.1.1.2) with probability: the dampness of the soil being a sign for it having rained
(I.1.2) with regard to the present
(I.1.2.1) necessarily: cockcrow designating hour of the night
(I.1.2.2) with probability: motherhood designating love
(I.1.3) with regard to the future
(I.1.3.1) necessarily: rosy dawn designating sunrise
(I.1.3.2) with probability: redness of the sunset sky designating a bright morning
(I.2) signifying by configuration and likeness: images, pictures, and so forth.
(I.3) signifying by causality (because something has been effected by something as their cause): smoke designating fire, tracks designating an animal
(II.1) signifying conventionally, with imperfect or perfect deliberation in the mode of the concept (cum deliberatione rationis, ad placitum sive ex proposito)

(II.1.1) linguistic signs
(II.1.1.1) by way of imperfect deliberation: interjections such as ‘ahem’ and ‘ugh’
(II.1.1.2) by way of perfect deliberation: other parts of speech
(II.1.2) non-linguistic signs (language of gestures, monastic sign language, sign-boards, and so forth.)
(II.2) signifying naturall, instinctively, without deliberation in the mode of affect (subito et sine deliberatione, non ad placitum, per modum affectus)
(II.2.1) products of the sensitive soul: sounds emitted by animals and persons
(II.2.2) products of the rational soul: groans, exclamations, cries of pain, laughter, sighs
Bacon divided signs into two principal classes: he distinguished between signs that are natural (signa naturalia) and those that are given and directed by a soul (signa ordinata ab anima ad significandum) (DS, §3, 82). The principle of division into these two classes was built in the kind of agency that constituted something as a sign; thus, natural signs are natural because their being a sign does not depend on an act, an intention of soul but is grounded in their own essence: for smoke to designate fire it does not require a soul who makes it so but a soul only to acknowledge smoke as actually being a sign for fire. Natural signs, according to Bacon, signify by themselves and do not require a soul for intending them to signify (that is, to make a sign), whereas in the case of “signs given by a soul,” the reason why a thing is a sign is in virtue of its generating act, its originating from a soul’s intent. A linguistic sign (like an idiomatic phrase, for example) requires a deliberating and freely choosing intellect; a vocal sound like a moan uttered by a human being for example requires a soul: not a deliberating and freely choosing soul but one that “suddenly and without deliberation” utters a certain sound. The first principle class of natural signs is divided into three subclasses; of these, groups (I.1) and (I.2) are based on the significative relationship arising from inference or resemblance. Group (I.3) is based on the notion that causally related events are also related as sign and significate like smoke (effect-sign) is related to fire (cause-significate). Group (I.1.1-3) is built on the basis of the significate being contemporaneous with, following, or preceding its sign. Of these the first (I.1.1-3) signifies in virtue of a relation of necessary or probable consequence, that is, in virtue of the fact that one could be inferred from the other with either probability or necessity – for example, from the fact that a woman has milk, it could necessarily be inferred, in regard to the past, that she was a mother, hence a woman having milk is a sign of motherhood (DS, §§4-6, 82f.).
Insofar as the double use of the class ‘natural signs’ is concerned (that is, the first principal class of signs (I) and the second sub-mode of the second principal class of given signs (II.2)), Bacon introduced a new and original division. According to Bacon, both smoke designating fire and a sigh uttered by a person are ‘natural signs’ but for different reasons. A natural sign (signum naturalis) is called whatever is naturally or automatically related to something else, that is, whatever signifies something on its own (significat ex essentia sua) as opposed to a sign given by a soul, that is, a sign requiring intention in order to signify. However, into the class of natural signification Bacon also included another group of signs, yet he placed this group under the principal class of signs given from a soul (II.2). This group included products – that is, vocal sounds (voces) of the sensitive and rational soul (signa ordinata ab anima) – yet without being dependent on any convention, and being common to all persons (such as various expressions of feelings emitted by animals (II.2.1) and persons (II.2.2) like sighs, laughter, or moans). Previous theorists like Boethius attempted to exclude this group from the principal class of conventional signs, or “signifying at pleasure” (voces significativae ad placitum). Instead, Boethius and other commentators on Aristotle’s On Interpretation – the locus classicus for discussing signs “signifying at pleasure” – included them (products in group II.1) into the group of natural signs while Augustine in his De Doctrina Christiana II,4 suspended judgment about this issue altogether.
To this debate Bacon contributed the original solution that in the two cases of natural signs, for example smoke and a sigh, ‘natural’ had been used equivocally; in other words, in each case the name ‘natural’ corresponds with a different definition: smoke is not a natural sign in the same sense in which a sigh is a natural sign (DS, §14, 85). In the first case of natural signs as opposed to given signs (group I), ‘natural’ indicates the relation of signifying, whereas in the second case (II.2) ‘natural’ indicates that the sounds (voces) are produced by the agent (an animal or a person) spontaneously, that is, without deliberation or free choice but rather following a natural instinct, urge, and power of something acting naturally (DS, §8, 83). And, as he continued, when vocal sounds signifiy naturally (naturaliter), then they are natural signs (DS, §14, 85). This means that vocal sounds like a person’s sigh or a cat’s meow are a) signs and b) natural signs because in both cases they originate from a sensitive soul that constitutes and directs them with intent in order to communicate some awareness of something, for example a sensation of pain, pleasure or bewilderment. This is the reason why a vocal sound produced by an animal or a person falls under the class of signs that are given and directed by a soul with intent. Indeed, many years earlier, Bacon had already noted that non-rational animals were able to communicate with one another by means of signifying vocal sounds (voces significativae) (SD, II, §§19-26, 222f.). “Whenever a rational soul was only affected and in that way affected expresses itself without [prior] deliberation, then an articulated vocal sound signifies naturally” (DS, §11, 84). Bacon also used the concept of ‘natural sign’ in his explanation of connotation (consignificatio).

d. Semantic Analyses within a Semiotic Context: Imposition, Analogy, and Connotation

Theories of imposition deal with the issue of how linguistic signs signify, that is, how a word relates to a concept or refers to an external object. Since it has become common practice to apply modern philosophical paradigms to the respective medieval debates, modern scholars speak of medieval accounts of extensionalist and intensionalist theories of semantics. The theory of imposition that Bacon proposed in the DS has commonly been considered an extensionalist semantics (according to which terms solely designate existent objects), a “semantics of imposition” or a “semantics of reference” (De Libera, 1997, 128; Perler, 2005, 390f.). Bacon’s semantics revolves around the concept of imposition, and defends the view that the meaning of a word is established not through its relation to a mental concept but through its relation to an external and actually existing object. In defending this idea, Bacon went, as far as basic semantic commitments are concerned, against the sententia communis of his time (see Fredborg, 1981; Maloney, 1984, De Libera, 1997, 117-132).
In the context of theories of imposition, it was a central idea of Bacon’s that words designate things rather than mental concepts, and that words are coined to signify present objects. Naming, as Bacon stated, presupposes the momentary intuition of an actual object and the certainty that it was not corrupted or non-existent, which is why upon the singular object’s absence they are not being named anymore (DS, §25, 90f.). When the singular object designated by a word is absent or not existing anymore, according to Bacon, and we still use the word originally denoting that object, we have a case of a new use of the word, a new imposition; the meaning of a word is variable, that is, one word can, at different times, denote different objects, which describes the problem of equivocation.
With regard to imposition, Bacon distinguished between two modes. Bacon considered the first, “formal” mode of imposition (sub forma impositionis vocaliter expressa et assignata rei) to take place in a manner similar to Baptism, in which a name is applied to a child in virtue of a perlocutionary vocal expression like “I call you ‘Roger’.” On this view, a name is attributed to an object as a result of a vocally expressed form of imposing (DS, §154, 130). This first, formal mode of imposition, according to Bacon, refers to an act of explicitly inventing a new word, or to the situation of composing a language, and it is exclusive to skilled persons, with expertise in the art of name-giving (DS, §156-157, 131). The second mode of imposition (sine forma imponendi vocaliter expressa) occurs when a name is given not through a perlocutionary vocal expression but “within the intellect alone,” that is, when a name is imposed tacitly and without being explicitly announced, in regard to an object other than the one designated in the situation of first imposition, and at the pleasure of the impositor. This mode of imposition acknowledges the arbitrary freedom of any speaker in the sense that everybody – and not only experts – performs this mode of imposition; during our everyday use of language we make and renew significations without the vocally expressed form of imposing “because names signify at pleasure” (DS, §157, 131). For example, when a person sees the painted image of a human being for the first time, she would not perform the formal perlocutionary act of imposition, but would rather simply transfer the name ‘human’ to the image. Applying this idea to theological matters, Bacon argued that in the same way a person who says that God is just for the first time did not beforehand say “God’s essence is called justice,” but rather, based on resemblance, she transferred the name of human justice to God and pronounced it by herself and in her own mind. As a consequence for interpersonal communication, Bacon’s proposal that the signifying function of a word is variable in its scope renders crucial the roles of the intention of the impositor and the interpreter in communication. On this view, the meaning of an utterance cannot be determined by considering the sense of the words alone; rather, successful communication in everyday life and accurate interpretation of authoritative texts like the Scriptures requires a careful analysis of language according to principles of the terminist tradition of logic. Thus, Bacon’s conception of imposition attempts to account for changes in meaning in cases where the possibilities are infinite and yet follow certain patterns; Bacon’s theory is laid out in his DS within a system of different grades of equivocation.
Bacon treated of the problem of equivocation and univocation in the context of his theory of how words signify; within the same framework he also developed his theory of analogy as a mode of signification. He understood equivocation to be the case when a word designates many different objects; since there are different kinds of diversity between objects, it follows that there is also a plurality of cases of equivocation. For example, the word ‘dog’ can refer to the animal as well as the constellation (DS, §36, 93; CST, §130, 110). Corresponding to the different degrees of diversity or agreement (convenientia) existing on the level of the word’s meaning, there are different degrees of equivocation: Bacon distinguished between five such degrees in the DS, and six in the CST, which are represented here schematically (DS, §§37-46, 94-98; CST, §§131-139, 110-116).
Principal equivocation maximal diversity between significates like in regard to being and non-being
Equivocation in relational agreement absolute diversity of significates yet agreement in relation between significates like in regard to creator and creature
Equivocation of whole and parts partial diversity, partial agreement of significates like in whole and parts, universal and particulars
Equivocation of genus Lesser partial diversity of significates like in regard to equus (genus) and horse / donkey (species)
Minimal equivocation great identity of significates, diversity of mode of signification like in ‘loving’ designating as name and participle (amans)
Minimal equivocation no diversity of significates, no diversity of signs (grounded in grammatical interpretation) like in bishops (nominative plural) and bishop’s (genitive singular) (episcopi)
The six different kinds of equivocation are arranged hierarchically, in descending order of diversity and, correspondingly, equivocation: because the degree (that is, the mode of equivocation) depends upon the kind of difference of the significates, it follows that the smaller the diversity of the significates, the smaller the degree of equivocation. While the last two instances of diversity, strictly speaking, represent cases of grammatical ambiguity rather than equivocation, cases 2-5 represent cases of analogy, because analogy (analogia, comparatio, proportio) occurs “wherever there is diversity between the primary and secondary significates while there is still agreement, reference, and comparison;” and the modes of analogy are between pure univocation and pure equivocation (DS, §100, 115). It has been pointed out in recent literature that the original and remarkable feature of Bacon’s theory of analogy lay in the nature of the classification, namely that analogy is here subordinated under equivocation rather than being classified as equivalent with equivocation and univocation as was common during his time. According to Bacon, analogy, as an instance of equivocation, indicates the kind of comparison or relation that occurs in cases of equivocation, and what is emphasized within an analysis of equivocation is accordingly an inquiry into primary and secondary instances of meaning (De Libera, 1997, 120).
In order to account for the change of meaning of words in regard to primary or principal and secondary meaning, Bacon did not only point toward acts of imposition but also to the phenomenon of connotation (consignificatio) – also called ‘implied’ or ‘secondary meaning.’ Inspired by the Logic of the Arabic philosophers Avicenna and al Ghazali, Bacon offered an explanation of this semantic issue together with a systematic enumeration of the different kinds of connotation by connecting it to the concept of ‘natural sign’ in the sense of the first principal class of natural signs (S I.1). In this respect, Bacon’s theory of connotation was remarkable because during his time connotation was not being treated in a systematic way in relation to natural signs, and it has been pointed out in recent scholarship that the fact that Bacon accounted for connotation within a framework that combines the notions of imposition and reference into one unified theory of meaning was quite innovative. In short, to explain connotation, Bacon combined his accounts of conventional and natural meaning (signa ad placitum signa naturalia), in virtue of which he was able “to give a detailed semiotic theory of psycho-linguistic phenomena” (De Libera, 1997, 128; Pinborg, 1981, 409).
According to Bacon, connotation occurrs when the change of meaning of a word is not because of another act of tacit imposition but because the significates stand in a natural relation to other objects. It is possible, as Bacon stated, for one word to designate a plurality of objects based on one single act of imposition because the objects themselves have a relation to other things. In other words, a word signifies many objects not only because it is intended to do so in virtue of an act of soul, but, beyond imposition, because things have necessary connections to other things which is natural in the sense of the first subclass of natural signs (I.1). Thus, words are natural signs and the respective semiotic relation is based on inference, concomitance, or consequence. This way, Bacon continued, words signify an infinity of objects (DS, §§102-103, 116f.). He consequently distinguished eight modes in which consignification occurs, among which he mentioned the names of God implying creation and the names of creature implying God (modes two and three), or accidents implying substances, and universals implying some particulars (modes four and five) (DS, §§105-133, 117-125; see Pinborg, 1981).
In the CST, written approximately twenty-five years after the DS which represented Bacon’s semantics within a broad semiotic framework, Bacon returned to semantic issues, intending a “logical reform of speech” directed against errors in philosophy and theology (De Libera, 1997, 121). He tried to achieve this reform with semantic analyses directed against contemporary theories of reference. Within these he especially criticized two aspects: ontological doctrines revolving around the doctrine of “habitual being” and “empty classes” (for example, sentences like “Caesar is a human being,” with Caesar being dead) and linguistic doctrines revolving around the traditional concept of imposition. Like in the DS, his theory of imposition in CST reaffirmed the thesis of the arbitrariness of meaning and of the freedom of the speaker. With regard to the DS, the CST resumed earlier objections and arguments, adapted them to the respective new context, yet did not represent any “significant development beyond the theories espoused in the De Signis, with the exception of the double division of natural signs” (Maloney, 1983, 150).
Thus, in his CST Bacon again argued against appeals to notions such as habitual being (esse habituale) and confused as opposed to determinate being (esse confusum et determinatum), which were brought forward by some of his contemporaries (for example, Richard Rufus of Cornwall, d. c. 1260) in order to defend the possibility of the truth value of sentences involving the use of the name ‘Caesar’ or ‘Christ’ (CST, §§84-111, 86-99). According to Bacon, words signifying existing and non-existing entities represent cases of equivocation, yet a sentence could only be true when its terms signify an existing entity. “Hence we know that in every equivocation there is a difference of significates: in as many ways as there is difference, in so many modes can there be equivocation” (CST, §130, 111). In this gradation of kinds of equivocation, the sentence “John is dead,” uttered upon John’s death, represents the greatest kind of equivocation: a word signifying being and non-being at the same time in which case the sentence, according to Bacon, has no truth value: after death, the word ‘John’ signifies not John – a being thing – but a corpse – a non-being thing – and is therefore used equivocally (CST, §125, 104). Thus, Bacon acknowledged the immediate relevance of the problem of equivocation for theology: for example in the context of exegesis one had to ensure that the words used in a passage actually signify.

5. Languages

Bacon’s interest in language studies was not restricted to semantic or semiotic questions. In the context of his linguistic studies, he devoted himself to grammar also (1) insofar as it pertained and contributed to the reading and speaking of languages, especially the so-called ‘wisdom languages’ like Hebrew and Greek, and (2) insofar as it was supposed ultimately to contribute to an improvement of the methods and instruments of textual criticism. Bacon situated the science of wisdom languages among the ranks of those sciences he considered essential for the advancement of learning (and which also including such sciences as mathematics or the experimental sciences). Ignorance of these sciences, Bacon emphasized on many occasions, is to the detriment of learning and, since the status of learning was connected to the general well-being of Christendom, is to the detriment of Christendom as a whole. Thus, the goal of Bacon’s concern for languages was, as in the case of his later semiotic-semantic inquiries, situated within the wider context of his intended reform of learning, a reform aiming at the “Church and the Republic of the Faithful.”
The main texts in which Bacon developed his philological reflections are the third part of the Opus Maius (a section entitled On the Utility of Grammar, a part that was comprised of three subsections of which the DS was one), the Opus Tertium, and the Compendium Studii Philosophiae (CSP). He also wrote a Greek grammar (Oxford Greek Grammar, or OGG), the first of its kind in the west, and a work which he considered to be no more than an “introduction to the Greek language.”

a. Language Groups and Functions

In addition to his grammatical, lexicographical and philological reflections, he devoted much time to the practical justification for the learning of languages. At the time when Bacon began to study languages, sometime around 1267-1268, this topic was not established as a university discipline. In the third part of the Opus Maius, Bacon presented three different kinds of reasons for language study: (1) such as pertain to the scientific domain, (2) such as pertain both to the secular and divine domains, (3) such as pertain to functions of the Church and the relation of the Church to other peoples. For example, he emphasized a better and more accurate comprehension of the scientific literature, of which the major part was written in languages other than Latin. In regard to divine offices or to the giving of the sacraments, Bacon lamented the lack of the priests’ abilities to correctly pronounce Greek, Hebrew, or Chaldean words. But Bacon also tried to bring more mundane matters to the attention of his primary intended reader, Pope Clement IV, such as the negotiation of peace treaties or the demands of trade for which knowledge of foreign languages would be most beneficial. Another field for which Bacon considered the knowledge of languages useful was the peaceful conversion of infidels (OM, III, vol. 3, 80-125).
In his reflections on the types of language, Bacon distinguishes three groups: (1) the so-called wisdom languages, (2) Latin, and (3) the “languages of the laity.” He presented the wisdom languages in two different groupings: (i) the first of these groups consists of the languages of the Cross (Hebrew, Greek, and Latin) because they express “divine mysteries;” (ii) the second group is comprised of the languages of philosophy (Hebrew, Greek, and Arabic), and sometimes also Chaldean (today called Aramaic). The importance of learning those languages had to do with the origins and passing on of wisdom; Bacon believed that all wisdom came from God who revealed it to faithful and infidel alike. Since God revealed his wisdom first in Hebrew, which was then renewed first in Greek (by Aristotle) and then in Arabic (most notably by Avicenna), scholars should have mastery of these languages in order to succeed in their scientific pursuits. In a similar vein, Bacon held Latin in much lower esteem: nothing original had been written in Latin, it was merely a repository of foreign learning. Opposed to the Latin of the clergy, Bacon also considered the so-called “vulgar-languages” or “languages of the laity,” which comprised a third group of languages. These languages, although inferior and not appropriate for scientific purposes because of the poverty of their vocabulary, were the ones that Bacon regarded as optimally suited for preaching (Rosier-Catach, 1997, 81-83).

b. Bacon’s Formulation of the Universal Principle of Grammar

Within the field of philology, Bacon also studied the relations between different languages and the structure of individual languages, and within this context he gave the famous formulation of the principle of universal grammar. Bacon stated that there are families of related languages like (1) Greek, (2) the Gallican language family, (3) the Slavic language family, and (4) Latin. Greek diversified itself into its different idioms Attic, Aeolian, Doric, and Ionian, while all these languages were substantially one. Bacon regarded Latin, on the other hand, as derived from Greek in both grammar and spoken language. Bacon held that the substance of a language guarantees the unity of a language and its identity in time, beyond accidental differences due to the different places at which the language is spoken and in spite of phonetic or semantic variations (CSP, vi-vii, 432-464). His comparatist analyses lead him even so far as to state that as there was something substantially identical in the various spoken languages, so there was something identical in the different grammars. In regard to this “linguistic ‘substance’” (Rosier-Catach, 1997, 86), Bacon suggested that it revealed itself in universal features common to all languages: “In its substance, grammar is one and the same in all languages, even if it accidentally varies” (OGG, 27). Accidental diversity, on the other hand, is another fundamental feature of language, according to Bacon, and it is due to the fact that language is conventional (ad placitum) and that every nation chose its own linguistic means: “In every language, words are given at pleasure, and this is why the Greeks imposed words according to their own will as we did according to our [will] and in accordance with the principles of our language as they in accordance with the principles of their language” (OGG, 164).

c. Philology within Bacon’s Program for the Reform of Learning

Bacon further connected his comparatist analyses to the reform of learning: the fact that, as Bacon noted further, each idiom has its own distinctive characteristics such as vocabulary, rhythmic and musical features, makes literal translations impossible. Therefore, translators like Michael Scot and Gerard of Cremona who, according to Bacon, in this sense were not absolutely proficient in the languages they translated from, corrupted important texts like Aristotle’s works as well as the Paris Vulgate (OT, ch. xxv, 91). Hence, what is needed are translators who were proficient enough in both scientific and linguistic skills – knowing the diversities of languages, their relationships, and the origins of words – to provide scholars with translations that meet scientific and linguistic standards. Thus, etymology was another important element in a diachronic analysis of languages, and Bacon sought to help his contemporaries, for example in regard to the pronunciation of foreign words, by providing them with lists of Hebrew and Greek words which had become Latin words (OGG, 133ff.).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

Below is a list of Bacon’s major works on logic and language in chronological order with English translations of the titles.

i. 1240’s-1250’s

  • Bacon, R. 1940. Summa Grammatica, ed. Robert Steele. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Summary of Grammar.
  • Bacon, R. 1986. Summulae dialectices. I: De termino. II: De enuntiatione. In Alain de Libera, ed., Archives d’Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen-Âge 53, 139-289.
    • Summary of Dialectics I-II.
  • Bacon, R. 1987. Summulae dialectices. III: De argumentatione. In Alain de Libera, ed., Archives d’Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen-Âge 54, 171-278.
    • Summary of Dialectics III.
  • Bacon, R. 2009. The Art and Science of Logic, translation, notes and introduction by Thomas S. Maloney. Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies.English translation of the Summulae Dialectices.

ii. 1250’s-1268: Papal Opera

  • Fredborg, K. M., Lauge Nielsen, and Jan Pinborg (Eds.). 1978. An unedited part of Roger Bacon’s ‘Opus Maius: De Signis’. Traditio 34, 75-136.
  • On Signs, fragment of Opus Maius, part three.

iii. 1268-1292

  • Bacon, R. 1902. Grammatica Graeca and Grammatica Hebraica (The Greek Grammar of Roger Bacon and a Fragment of His Hebrew Grammar), ed. Edmund Nolan and S. A. Hirsch. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • The exact dating of the two grammars is not determined.
  • Bacon, R. 1988. Compendium Studii Theologiae, edition and translation with introduction and notes by Thomas S. Maloney (Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters, 20). Leiden: Brill.
    • Summary of the Study of Theology.

b. Secondary Sources

Excellent overviews on the principal themes, arguments and authors are provided in:

i. General Studies on Medieval Theories of Language

  • Ashworth, E. J. 2003. Language and logic. In A. S. McGrade, ed., Cambridge Companion to Medieval Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 73-96.
    • Brief overview on the principal themes in medieval theories of language and logic.
  • Bursill-Hall, Geoffrey, Sten Ebbesen and E. F. K. Koerner. (Eds.). 1990. De Ortu Grammaticae: Studies in Medieval Grammar and Linguistic Theory in Memory of Jan Pinborg. Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing Company.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, Anthony Kenny and Jan Pinborg. (Eds.). 1982. The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Contains overview articles on “The old logic,” “Logic in the high middle ages: Semantic theory,” and “Logic in the high middle ages: Propositions and modalities.”
  • Pasnau, Robert and Christina Van Dyke. (Eds.). 2010. The Cambridge History of Medieval PhilosophyVolume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Rosier, Irène. 1994. La Parole Comme Acte: Sur la Grammaire Et La Sémantique au XIIIe Siècle. Paris: Vrin.
    • Focuses on the ‘intentionalist’ current in grammar, special attention to Roger Bacon.

ii. On Roger Bacon’s Philosophy of Language

  • Bourgain, P. 1989. Les sens de la langue chez Roger Bacon. In Traduction et traducteurs au Moyen Age. Paris: Editions du CNRS, 317-331.
  • De Libera, Alain. 1981. Roger Bacon et le probleme de l’appellatio univoca. In H. A. G. Braakhuis, C. H. Kneepkens and L. M. de Rijk, eds., English Logic and Semantics: From the End of the Twelfth Century to the Time of Ockham and Burleigh. Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers, 193-234.
  • De Libera, Alain. 1990. De la logique à la grammaire: Remarques sur la théorie de la determination chez Roger Bacon et Lambert d’Auxerre (Lambert de Lagny). In G. Bursill-Hall, S. Ebbesen and K. Koerner, eds., De grammatica: A Tribute to Jan Pinborg. Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing Company, 209-226.
  • De Libera, Alain. 1991. Roger Bacon et la reference vide. Sur quelques antecedents médiévaux du paradoxe de Meinong. In J. Jolivet, Z. Kaluza and A. De Libera, eds., Lectionem Varietates: Homages á Paul Vignaux. Paris: Vrin, 85-120.
  • De Libera, Alain. 1997. Roger Bacon et la logique. In Jeremiah Hackett, ed., Roger Bacon and the Sciences: Commemorative Essays. Leiden: Brill, 103-132.
  • Fredborg, Karin Margareta. 1981. Roger Bacon on ‘Impositio vocis ad significandum’. In H. A. G. Braakhuis, C. H. Kneepkens and L. M. de Rijk, eds., English Logic and Semantics: From the End of the Twelfth Century to the Time of Ockham and Burleigh. Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers, 167-191.
  • Hovdhaugen, Even. 1990. Una et eadem: Some observations on Roger Bacon’s Greek grammar. In Geoffrey L. Bursill-Hall, Sten Ebbesen and E. F. K. Koerner, eds., De ortu Grammaticae: Studies in Medieval Grammar and Linguistic Theory in memory of Jan Pinborg. Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing Company, 117-131.
  • Maloney, Thomas S. 1983a. Roger Bacon on the significatum of words. In Lucie Brind’Amour and Eugene Vance, eds., Archéologie du Signe (Papers in Medieval Studies, 3). Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies, 187-211.
  • Maloney, Thomas S. 1983b. The semiotics of Roger Bacon. Medieval Studies 45, 120-154.
  • Maloney, Thomas S. 1984. Roger Bacon on equivocation. Vivarium 22, 85-112.
  • Maloney, Thomas S. 1985. The extreme realism of Roger Bacon. Review of Metaphysics 38, 807-837.
  • Maloney, Thomas S. 1995. Is the De doctrina christiana the source for Bacon’s semiotics? In Edward D. English, ed., Reading and Wisdom: The De Doctrina Christiana of Augustine in the Middle Ages. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 126-42.
  • Perler, Dominik. 2005. Logik – eine ‘wertlose Wissenschaft?’ Zum Verhältnis von Logik und Theologie. In Dominik Perler and Ulrich Rudolph, eds., Logik und Theologie: Das Organon im Arabischen und im Lateinischen Mittelalter. Leiden: Brill, 375-399.
  • Pinborg, Jan. 1981. Roger Bacon on Signs: A newly recovered part of the Opus Maius. In Herausgegeben Von Jan P. Beckmann, Ludger Honnefelder, Gabriel Jussen, Barbara Munxelhaus, Gangolf Schrimpf, and Georg Wieland Unter Leitung Von Wolfgang Kluxen, eds., Sprache und Erkenntnis im Mittelalter: Volume 1. New York: Walter de Gruyter, 403-412.
  • Rosier, Irène. 1984. Grammaire, loqique, sémantique, deux positions opposées au XIIIe siècle: Roger Bacon et les modistes. Histoire Epistémologie Langage 6, 21-34.
  • Rosier, Irène. 1994. La Parole Comme Acte: Sur la Grammaire Et la Sémantique au XIIIe Siècle. Paris: Vrin.
  • Rosier, Irène. 1997. Roger Bacon and grammar. In Jeremiah Hackett, ed., Roger Bacon and the Sciences: Commemorative Essays. Leiden: Brill, 67-102.
  • Rosier, Irène. 1998. Roger Bacon, al-Farabi, et Augustin. Rhétorique, logique et philosophie morale. In Gilbert Dahan and Irène Rosier-Catach, eds., La rhétorique d’Aristote: traditions et commentaires, de l’Antiquité au XVIIe Siècle. Paris: Vrin, 87–110.
  • Rosier, Irène and De Libera, Alain. 1986. Intention de signifier et engendrement du discours chez Roger Bacon. Histoire, Epistémologie, Langage 8, 63-79.

Author Information

Pia Antolic-Piper
James Madison University
U. S. A.