Bioethics is a rather young academic inter-disciplinary field that has emerged rapidly as a particular moral enterprise against the background of the revival of applied ethics in the second half of the twentieth century. The notion of bioethics is commonly understood as a generic term for three main sub-disciplines: medical ethics, animal ethics, and environmental ethics. Each sub-discipline has its own particular area of bioethics, but there is a significant overlap of many issues, ethical approaches, concepts, and moral considerations. This makes it difficult to examine and to easily solve vital moral problems such as abortion, xenotransplantation, cloning, stem cell research, the moral status of animals and the moral status of nature (the environment). In addition, the field of bioethics presupposes at least some basic knowledge of important life sciences, most notably medicine, biology (including genetics), biochemistry, and biophysics in order to deal successfully with particular moral issues. This article also contains a discussion about the vital issue of moral status—and hence protection—in the context of bioethics, that is, whether moral status is ascribed depending on rationality, harm, or any other feature. For example, it might well be the case that non-sentient beings such as plants and unique stone formations, such as the Grand Canyon, do have a moral standing—at least, to some degree—and should not be deliberately destroyed by virtue of either their instrumental or intrinsic value for human beings. The last part contains a discussion of the main bioethical theories including their main line of reasoning and complex challenges in contemporary philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Preliminary Distinctions
  2. A Brief History of Bioethics
    1. The Origin of the Notion of Bioethics
    2. The Origin of the Academic Discipline and Institutionalization of Bioethics
    3. The Origin of Bioethics as a Phenomenon
  3. Sub-disciplines in Bioethics
    1. Introduction
    2. Medical Ethics
    3. Animal Ethics
    4. Environmental Ethics
  4. The Idea of Moral Status in Bioethics
  5. Theory in Bioethics
    1. Introduction
    2. Deontological Approaches
    3. Utilitarianism
    4. The Four-Principle Approach
    5. Virtue Ethics
    6. Casuistry
    7. Feminist Bioethics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. References
    2. Further Reading

1. Preliminary Distinctions

Rapid developments in the natural sciences and technology (including biotechnology) have greatly facilitated better living conditions and increased the standard of living of people worldwide. On the other hand, there are undesirable consequences, such as nuclear waste, water and air pollution, the clearing of tropical forests, and large-scale livestock farming, as well as particular innovations such as gene technology and cloning, which have caused qualms and even fears concerning the future of humankind. Lacunae in legal systems, for example, regarding abortion and euthanasia, additionally are a cause of grave concern for many people. Furthermore, moral problems which stem from a concrete situation, for example, gene-manipulated food, have given rise to heated public debates and serious public concerns with regard to safety issues in the past. There was---and still is---a need for ethical guidance which is not satisfied simply by applying traditional ethical theories to the complex and novel problems of the twenty-first century.

What are the general goals of bioethics? As a discipline of applied ethics and a particular way of ethical reasoning that substantially depends on the findings of the life sciences, the goals of bioethics are manifold and involve, at least, the following aspects:

  1. Discipline: Bioethics provides a disciplinary framework for the whole array of moral questions and issues surrounding the life sciences concerning human beings, animals, and nature.
  2. Inter-disciplinary Approach: Bioethics is a particular way of ethical reasoning and decision making that: (i) integrates empirical data from relevant natural sciences, most notably medicine in the case of medical ethics, and (ii) considers other disciplines of applied ethics such as research ethics, information ethics, social ethics, feminist ethics, religious ethics, political ethics, and ethics of law in order to solve the case in question.
  3. Ethical Guidance: Bioethics offers ethical guidance in a particular field of human conduct.
  4. Clarification: Bioethics points to many novel complex cases, for example, gene technology, cloning, and human-animal chimeras and facilitates the awareness of the particular problem in public discourse.
  5. Structure: Bioethics elaborates important arguments from a critical examination of judgements and considerations in discussions and debates.
  6. Internal Auditing: The combination of bioethics and new data that stem from the natural sciences may influence−in some cases −the key concepts and approaches of basic ethics by providing convincing evidence for important specifications, for example, the generally accepted concept of personhood might be incomplete, too narrow, or ethically problematic in the context of people with disability and, hence, need to be modified accordingly.

In other words, bioethics is concerned with a specific area of human conduct concerning the animate (for example, human beings and animals) and inanimate (for example, stones) natural world against the background of the life sciences and deals with the various problems that arise from this complex amalgam. Furthermore, bioethics is not only an inter-disciplinary field but also multidisciplinary since bioethicists come from various disciplines, each with its own distinctive set of assumptions. While this facilitates new and valuable perspectives , it also causes problems for a more integrated approach to bioethics.

2. A Brief History of Bioethics

Historically speaking, there are three possible ways at least to address the history of bioethics. First, by the origin of the notion of bioethics, second, by the origin of the academic discipline and the institutionalization of bioethics, and third, by the origin of bioethics as a phenomenon. Each focuses on different aspects concerning the history of bioethics; however, one can only understand and appreciate the whole picture if one takes all three into account.

a. The Origin of the Notion of Bioethics

It is commonly said that the origin of the notion of bioethics is twofold: (i) the publishing of two influential articles; Potter’s “Bioethics, the Science of Survival” (1970), which suggests viewing bioethics as a global movement in order to foster concern for the environment and ethics, and Callahan’s “Bioethics as a Discipline” (1973), in which he argues for the establishment of a new academic discipline, and (ii) discussions between Shriver and Hellegers about the need for an institute in which researchers should examine and analyse medical dilemmas by appealing to moral philosophy (1970). This institute was created in 1971 as the Joseph and Rose Kennedy Center for the Study of Human Reproduction and Bioethics, and is now known as the Kennedy Institute of Ethics (see, also the Institute of Society, Ethics, and the Life Sciences, 1969). However, this  oft-repeated story about the origin of the term bioethics is incorrect. Sass (2007) is right in claiming that the German theologian Fritz Jahr published three articles in 1927, 1928, and 1934 using the German term “Bio-Ethik” (which translates as “Bio-Ethics”) and forcefully argued, both for the establishment of a new academic discipline,  and for the practice of a new, more civilized, ethical approach to issues concerning human beings and the environment. Jahr famously proclaimed his bioethical imperative: “Respect every living being, in principle, as an end in itself and treat it accordingly wherever it is possible,” (1927: 4).

b. The Origin of the Academic Discipline and Institutionalization of Bioethics

The origin of the discipline of bioethics in the USA goes hand in hand with the origin of its institutionalization. At the beginning of this complex process, bioethics was seen as more or less identical with medical ethics−the latter notion is first mentioned by Thomas Percival (1803) −and was mainly conducted by philosophers, theologians, and a few physicians. Animal ethics and environmental ethics are sub-disciplines which emerged at a later date. In the beginning, the great demand for medical ethics was grounded in reaction to some negative events, such as the research experiments on human subjects committed by the Nazis and the Tuskegee Syphilis Study (1932–1972) in the USA. At that time, bioethics was rather driven by urgent cases (“putting out fires”) and did not consider systematic problems in healthcare such as the access to quality care. However, in reaction to these horrible events, the Nuremberg Code (1947) and the Declaration of Helsinki (1964) were created in order to provide researchers and physicians with ethical guidelines. In the case of the Tuskegee Syphilis Study (Belmont Report 1979), and other experiments in clinical research (Beecher 1966), one has to concede however that they were performed in the full knowledge of both sets of guidelines (and hence against the basic and most important idea of individual informed consent).

In particular, the idea of individual informed consent is due to the Prussian and German bureaucratic regulations of 1900/01 that appeal to the case of Dr. Albert Neisser in 1896 who publicly announced his concern about the possible dangers to the experimental subjects whom he vaccinated with an experimental immunizing serum (Zentralblatt der gesamten Unterrichtsverwaltung in Preussen 1901: 188). Additionally, the investigation of the death of 75 German children caused by the use of experimental tuberculosis vaccines in 1931 revealed that the mandatory informed consent was not obtained (Rundschreiben des Reichsministers des Inneren 28.2.1931, in: Sass 1989: 362-366). Baker rightly states that “the informed consent doctrine was thus originally a regulatory innovation created by Prussian bureaucrats; it was not an artefact of American legal or philosophical culture but of German bureaucratic culture. It was a German solution to problems created by the advances of German biomedical science” (Baker 1998: 250).

Furthermore, influential books such as Morals and Medicine: The Moral Problems of the Patient’s Right to Know the Truth, Contraception, Artificial Insemination, Sterilization, and Euthanasia (Fletcher 1954) and Ramsey’s ground breaking book, The Patient as Person: Explorations in Medical Ethics (1970) argued that there was a serious and urgent need for thinking about complex moral issues in medicine and thereby facilitated the creation of the new academic discipline of  medical ethics (also known as bioethics).

Against this background, the Institute of Society, Ethics, and the Life Sciences (1969), later known as the Hastings Center, and the Joseph and Rose Kennedy Center for the Study of Human Reproduction and Bioethics (1971) were created. They were the first two (academic) institutions to conduct research in medical ethics and to publish high quality academic journals: the Hastings Center Report and the Kennedy Institute of Ethics Journal. Many bioethics programs and degrees were established at universities in the USA during the 1970s and 1980s in order to provide students−most notably medical, law, and public policy students−with some expertise in medical ethics to deal with complex cases. In the early years, the bioethics programs were mainly funded by foundations such as the Rockefeller Foundation, the Russell Sage Foundation, the Ford Foundation and others, as well as by donations from individuals such as the Kennedy family.

The need for medical ethics experts and commissions was fostered by a series of important events in medicine, especially the Harvard Definition of Brain Death (1968), Roe v. Wade (1973), the Karen Ann Quinlan case (1975), and Baby Doe (1982). Since, most hospitals in the USA provide clinical ethics consultation that is mainly due to the requirement of The Joint Commission for Accreditation of Healthcare Organizations---in 2007 renamed the Joint Commission---that accredited hospitals must have a method for addressing ethical issues that arise (JCAHO 1992: 106).

Furthermore, new technologies in the life sciences caused new inventions and possibilities for the survival of the sick; kidney dialysis, intensive care units, organ transplantation, and respirators, to name just a few. Severe problems concerning the just distribution of health care resources emerged, for example, in access to kidney dialysis and intensive care units due to the consequences of scarcity, which caused much debate (concerning problems of resource allocation, for instance). The upshot is that the origins of bioethics as a discipline and its institutionalization can be traced back to the second half of the twentieth century in the USA. Other countries then adapted to the new situation and established their own bioethics programs and institutions.

c. The Origin of Bioethics as a Phenomenon

The notion of bioethics and the origin of the discipline of bioethics and its institutionalization in academia is a modern development. The phenomenon itself, however, can be traced back, at least with any certainty, to the Hippocratic Oath in Antiquity (500 B.C.E.) in the case of medical ethics (Jonsen 2008) and possibly beyond if one considers the Code of Hammurabi (1750 B.C.E.), which contains some written provisions related to medical practice (Kuhse and Singer 2009: 4).

The idea that animals have a moral status (§4) and should be protected is based in modern moral philosophy, most notably utilitarianism, on the one hand, and the animal rights movement in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries in Europe (in particular, England and Germany) and the USA. On the other hand, Aristotle, Thomas Aquinas, and Kant had a lasting (negative) effect on the way people thought about animals and their moral status. According to Aristotle (400 B.C.E.), animals do not have a moral status and hence human beings cannot treat them unjustly. This line of thought was omnipresent during the time of the Romans and was reflected their great pleasure in animal hunts in the Colosseum and the Circus Maximus between the second century B.C.E. and the sixth century C.E. Researchers estimate that hundreds of thousands of animals were killed in order to please the public (“panem et circenses”). Only one incident is documented in the long and bloody history of cruelty against animals in Rome, when the audience sided with a group of elephants and proclaimed that the emperor showed cruelty to these majestic creatures, which was seen by the public as an “immoral act”. According to Thomas Aquinas (thirteenth century), who shaped the Christian view on the moral status of animals for several hundred years, animals have no moral status and human beings are allowed to use them for their own comfort since everything is made by God and subjected to the rule of human beings. Kant (eighteenth century) famously argued that animals have no moral status but one should treat them appropriately since cruelty against animals might have a negative effect on our behaviour towards our fellow humans, that is, the brutalization of human behaviour.

The idea of protecting nature/the environment is a contemporary thought that particularly evolved by virtue of public concern about the rapid technological developments in the twentieth century and the extreme dangers to the whole globe posed by these developments, for example, nuclear waste, water and air pollution, the clearing of tropical forests, and global warming. The point is, however, that a concern for bioethical issues is much older than the name of the phenomenon itself and the academic discipline.

3. Sub-disciplines in Bioethics

a. Introduction

Bioethics is a discipline of applied ethics and comprises three main sub-disciplines: medical ethics, animal ethics, and environmental ethics. Even though they are “distinct” branches in focusing on different areas---namely, human beings, animals, and nature---they have a significant overlap of particular issues, vital conceptions and theories as well as prominent lines of argumentation. Solving bioethical issues is a complex and demanding task. An interesting analogy in this case is that of a neural network in which the neural knot can be compared to the bioethical problem, and the network itself can be compared to the many different links to other vital issues and moral problems on different levels (and regarding different disciplines and sub-disciplines). Sometimes it seems that the attempt to settle a moral problem stirs up a hornets’ nest because many plausible suggestions cause further (serious) issues. However, a brief overview of the bioethical sub-disciplines is as follows.

b. Medical Ethics

The oldest sub-discipline of bioethics is medical ethics which can be traced back to the introduction of the Hippocratic Oath (500 B.C.E.). Of course, medical ethics is not limited to the Hippocratic Oath; rather that marks the beginning of Western ethical reasoning and decision making in medicine. The Hippocratic Oath is a compilation of ancient texts concerning the proper behaviour of physicians and the relationship between physician and patient. It also contains some binding ethical rules of utmost importance such as the well known principle of non-maleficence (“primum non nocere”) and the principle of beneficence (“salus aegroti suprema lex”); furthermore, doctor-patient confidentiality and the prohibition on exploiting the patient (including sexual exploitation) are important rules that are still valid.

Other more critical elements of the Hippocratic Oath such as the strict prohibition of euthanasia and abortion seem to be rather debatable and raise the vital question of how to distinguish between valuable and less valuable principles it proposes. In contemporary bioethics, euthanasia is---in general---widely regarded as an eligible autonomous decision of the patient that must be respected. With regard to abortion, most bioethicists believe that it should be allowed, at least, under certain circumstances, but this issue is still hotly debated and causes many emotional responses. The upshot is that one needs a more fundamental theoretical analysis of the particular elements of the Hippocratic Oath in order to determine possible traditional shortcomings in more detail before one accepts them as a fixed set of unquestionable professional rules. Furthermore, the idea that “the physician knows best” and should be able to act against the will of the patient for the benefit of the patient (that is, the patriarchal model of the physician-patient relationship) also originated in ancient times. The competence of the physician was too overwhelming for most people so that they almost always complied with the physician’s advice.

In medical ethics, one is concerned with the general ethical question of “what should one do” under the particular circumstances of medicine. In this respect, medical ethics is not different from basic ethics but it is limited to the area of medicine and deals with its particular state of affairs.

There are a number of important traditional issues in medical ethics that still need to be solved. These include beginning- and end-of-life issues (notably abortion, euthanasia, and limiting therapeutic treatments), the physician-patient relationship, research on human beings (including research ethics and human genetics). More recent medical issues include reproductive decision making, organ transplantation, just distribution of healthcare resources, access to healthcare, and most recently vital issues concerning healthcare systems and (global) public health. In the twentieth century, medical ethics was focused on−but not limited to− two main issues: the concept of personhood (for example, the Singer debate) and the principle of autonomy (that is, individual informed consent). The rise of autonomy in the context of the physician-patient relationship can be seen as the counter-movement to paternalism in healthcare. Both vital issues pervaded many debates in medical ethics in the past and can been seen as key issues that shaped the discussions in academia, at the theoretical level, and were highly influential on the ward, that is in practice, as well.

c. Animal Ethics

The history of ethics is to some extent a history of who is and should be part of the moral community. Roughly speaking, in Antiquity only men of a particular social status were part of the moral community; several hundred years later, after a long and hard social struggle women achieved equal status with men−even though there is still a long way to go in many parts of most societies (for example, in the job market and equal pay for equal work). The idea that animals should be part of the moral community mainly evolved in the context of the ethics of utilitarianism in the nineteenth century, most notably spearheaded by Jeremy Bentham, who famously argued that it does not matter morally whether animals can reason but rather whether they can suffer. In addition, animal rights groups were founded in the USA and Europe (in particular, in Protestant England and Germany) by virtue of a new awareness of sensitivity towards cruelty against animals (for example, vivisection) and a growing feeling of compassion for the suffering of animals in general (see Schopenhauer). This new paradigmatic moral shift was supported by the scientific findings of Darwin’s evolutionary theory. The findings undermined the sharp (empirical) distinction between human and animal posed by the traditional natural rights position that only rational human beings are part of the moral community (see also the objection of speciesism, §3d). Evolutionary theory provides convincing empirical evidence that there is a natural kinship between human beings and animals in the sense that human beings evolved from animals through  a long, gradual process.

Current problems include research on animals (including vivisection), livestock farming and animal transports, xenotransplantation, human-animal chimera, meat eating versus vegetarianism/veganism, the legitimacy of zoos and circuses, religious freedom versus animal protection, recreational hunting, and the growing conflict between the protection of the environment and animal welfare. These pose complex moral issues that need to be addressed appropriately by responding to the question of whether animals have a moral status in general (and why), and, if they do, what their exact moral rank is.

All ethical viewpoints defending the protection of animals broaden the scope of the traditional position by claiming that the ability to suffer is the key point and hence sentient beings should be protected as part of the moral community. Two ground-breaking and highly influential books written by the utilitarian Peter Singer (1975) and Tom Regan (1983), who favors a Kantian-oriented approach, were the starting point of a more sophisticated discussion in academia and which also influenced many laypeople across the world. Singer argues for a utilitarian animal ethics based on the equal consideration of interests of sentient beings in combination with the criterion of the ability to feel pain. Regan claims instead that sentient beings who are able to see themselves as “subjects of life” do have an “inherent value” which provides them with strong defensible moral rights that implicate prima facie duties for human beings towards animals. Other  ethical approaches contribute important insights as well. Virtue ethics calls for one not to undermine the aspiration of the good life by acting in a cruel way towards animals but acknowledge the animal-like part of one's existence (Midgley 1984). Feminist care ethics implies animals stand in an asymmetrical relation of care and responsibility towards human beings (Donovan and Adams 1996). Discourse ethics implies animals are part of the moral community through the voice of a surrogate decision maker (Habermas 1997).

d. Environmental Ethics

Generally speaking, environmental ethics deals with the moral dimension of the relationship between human beings and non-human nature−animals and plants, local populations, natural resources and ecosystems,  landscapes, as well as the biosphere and the cosmos. Strictly speaking, human beings are, of course, part of nature and it seems somewhat odd to claim that there is a contrast between human beings and non-human nature. At second glance, however, it seems reasonable to make this distinction because human beings are the only beings who are able to reason about the consequences of their actions which may influence the whole of nature or parts of nature in a positive or negative way.

Ideas about the “right” conduct concerning the environment are as old as humankind but the establishment of environmental ethics as an academic discipline dates back to the 1970s when issues of vital importance emerged, such as the global threat to the natural basis of existence, the growing number of extinct species, the destruction of ecosystems and natural resources, as well as the more recognized dangers of technological inventions---for example, nuclear power, including its radioactive waste, and the new biotechnologies like genetic engineering. The exploitation of the environment was first justified by the religious teachings of the Old Testament (such as the stewardship of the environment in the Bible) and, during the secular period of the Enlightenment, supported by Francis Bacon’s scientific program to (rigorously) disclose all the secrets of nature. René Descartes’ famous and influential dualism of rational beings, on the one hand, and soulless matter, on the other hand, led to the debasement of nature, including animals, since the objects of morality were by nature rational beings only. The first serious counter-movement can be traced back to the Romantic philosophies of nature of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. In the non-Western context, the idea of respect for and valuing nature is more prevalent and at least 2500 years old, referring to the general teachings of Hinduism and Buddhism which influenced the Western view in Europe in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries (for example, Schopenhauer). Of course, contemporary environmentalists, particularly feminist ethicists and supporters of the idea of natural aesthetics, have refined the criticism of the traditional view by claiming that animals and nature are not valueless but deserving of moral protection.

It is possible to make the following broad distinctions regarding environmental ethics. Environmental ethics is commonly divided into two distinct areas: (i) anthropocentrism and (ii) non-anthropocentrism (or physiocentrism). Anthropocentric approaches such as virtue ethics and deontology stress the particular human perspective, and claim that values depend on human beings only. Values are relational and require a rational being, hence animals and non-human nature are not per se objects of morality, unless indirectly, by virtue of a surrogate decision maker. According to the anthropocentric view, only (rational) human beings deserve moral protection although one should respect and protect nature either for the sake of human beings (instrumental view) or for the sake of nature itself (non-instrumental view). Anthropocentrism is faced with the objection of speciesism, the view that the mere affiliation to the species of Homo sapiens is sufficient to grant a higher moral status to human beings in comparison with animals. Singer has powerfully claimed, however, that the “mere difference of species in itself cannot determine moral status” (Singer 2009: 567).

Non-anthropocentrism (or physiocentrism) mainly consists of three main branches: (1) pathocentrism, (2) biocentrism, and (3) ecocentrism, which can be further divided into an individualistic and holistic version. All non-anthropocentric approaches share the common claim that there are “objective” or more straightforward naturalistic values which are non-relational (intrinsic) and do not presuppose rational human beings. Nature (including animals) itself is valuable, independently of whether there are any human beings or not (non-instrumental view), even though one has to acknowledge the fact that many arguments about intrinsic value also have instrumental underpinnings. Supporters of pathocentrism argue that all sentient beings deserve moral consideration and protection, equally/egalitarian or non-equally/non-egalitarian with reference to human beings (see Singer 1975, Regan 1983, Wolf 1996). Adherents of biocentrism claim that all beings should be part of the moral community. Finally, supporters of ecocentrism argue that the whole of nature deserves moral protection, either according to an individualistic or holistic approach. If individualistically, all “things” in nature are bearers of moral values and are of equal moral worth. If holistically, there are traditionally at least three main positions: (a) ecofeminism, (b) deep ecology, and (c) the land ethics. Ecofeminists believe that there is a parallel between the systems of domination that affect both women and nature. Therefore, if human beings are willing to change the way they act towards nature, they must understand the real causes of the problem−the idea that nature is rather irrational and passive as well as needing to be controlled by human beings (Plumwood 1986, Warren 1987). According to deep ecologists, human beings should view themselves as being a part of and not distinct from the natural world by virtue of a refined notion of the self. All living things, according to the founder of deep ecology, Arne Naess, have an equal right to flourish (“biospherical egalitarianism”). Proponents of the land ethics argue that one should stop  treating the land as a mere resource, but view it as a precious source of energy. Aldo Leopold, the founder of land ethics, famously claims: “A thing is right when it tends to preserve the integrity, stability, and beauty of the biotic community. It is wrong when it tends otherwise.” (Leopold 1949/1989: 218-225).

4. The Idea of Moral Status in Bioethics

Bioethical debates, particularly in animal ethics and environmental ethics, are concerned with issues of moral status and moral protection. The vital question is, for example, whether all animals have a moral status and hence are members of the moral community enjoying moral protection or whether they do not have a moral status at all (or only to some degree for some animals, such as higher mammals such as great apes, dolphins and elephants). But, even if animals do not have a moral status and hence have no moral rights, it could be the case that they still are morally significant in the sense that human beings are not allowed to do whatever they want to do with them (for example, to torture animals for fun). The fundamental idea of granting a living being a moral status is to protect the particular being from various kinds of harm which undermine the being's flourishing. For example, one can protect the great apes by granting them a moral status which is important for their survival since one can then legally enforce their moral right not to be killed.

But what are the prerequisites for ascribing a being a moral status and hence moral rights and (legal) protection? And, furthermore, what about non-sentient nature, such as tropical rainforests, the Grand Canyon, mammoth trees, and beautiful landscapes? Do they have a moral status as well? Are they morally significant at least to some degree? Or are human beings allowed to do whatever they want to do with non-human nature?

Traditionally, philosophers made the distinction between sentient beings and non-sentient beings (including the environment) and argued that only beings who have an intrinsic worth are valuable and hence deserve moral concern and (legal) protection. Therefore, it is the intrinsic worth of the particular being that is important for the ascription of the being’s moral status as well as the being’s moral and legal protection. If a being has no intrinsic worth, then it has no moral status, and so forth. It has been commonly argued that the intrinsic worth of a being can be fleshed out by claiming that it is rationality or the capacity to reason which is the underlying motif for ascribing “intrinsic worth” (for example, Kant). This line of reasoning is anthropocentric and is faced with the objection of speciesism (§3d). A somewhat different view is, for example, to claim that even the Grand Canyon has an intrinsic worth by virtue of its uniqueness and great beauty. In this respect, the notion of intrinsic worth is fleshed out by the idea of uniqueness and beauty and hence one avoids (to some degree) anthropocentrism and the objection of speciesism. But, on the other hand, this position seems questionable for at least two important reasons. First, “being unique” seems to be of no moral importance at all. For example, if a dog was born with two heads, one might say that this is unique but it would seem awkward to grant the dog protection by virtue of his two heads. Rather, one would be more likely to protect him in order to study the dog's particular abnormality. This, however, has nothing to do with the dog’s supposed intrinsic worth based on his uniqueness but everything to do with his instrumental value for some scientists. Secondly, to say that something (or someone) is “beautiful” seems to presuppose a sentient being that values the particular thing in the first place; hence we are not concerned with an intrinsic worth but rather with an instrumental worth with reference to a particular valuer. According to this reasoning, the Grand Canyon should be protected since it causes great experiences in people who stand in awe of this landscape when they appreciate the great beauty of it and simply feel good about it.

Some scholars argue that one has to be cautious of examining the moral status of non-human nature through the lens of a purely anthropocentric line of reasoning because it conceptually downplays the value of animals and the environment right from the start. However, on the other hand, many people find it questionable to argue for the moral rights of stones, sunflowers, and earthworms. Even so, it seems plausible to consider that there might be a significant distinction between the moral status of stones, sunflowers, and earthworms by virtue of their instrumental value for human beings. For example, the Grand Canyon might have a certain moral status because this unique stone formation makes human beings not only view it with awe, but also aesthetically admire it, which is the reason not to deliberately destroy the Grand Canyon. Sunflowers are nice to look at and hence are enjoyable for human beings, therefore one should not deliberately destroy them; earthworms are useful for the thriving of plants (including sunflowers) which is good both for animals and human beings since they loosen the ground, and hence they should not be deliberately destroyed as well. The differing moral status of stones, sunflowers, and earthworms---if there is any---could then be eventually ranked according to their particular instrumental value for human beings. Or one could argue that stones, sunflowers, and earthworms have an intrinsic (that is, non-instrumental) value in so far as they are valuable as such. Then, a possible ranking concerning their moral status might either depend on their supposed usefulness for other entities (a case of intrinsic value with instrumental underpinnings) or on a fixed general order of non-instrumental values: first, animals, second, animated plants, and third, the most inanimate, such as stones. Against this fixed order, however, some people could object that mammoth trees---the gigantic several hundred years old majestic trees---should be ranked higher than simple earthworms because they are very rare and make human beings view them with awe.  That is, it might well be the case that sometimes animated plants such as majestic mammoth trees morally outweigh lower forms of animals such as earthworms. Furthermore, one could even argue, then, that the Grand Canyon morally outweighs a group of majestic mammoth trees and so forth. As a result, it seems reasonable to acknowledge the fact that there is no easy way to determine: (1) The exact moral status between different life forms within the animated group, as well as the moral status between the animated and the most inanimated in non-human nature, and (2) the exact moral status between human and non-human nature, if one does not hold the view that human beings have the same moral standing as animals and plants (that is, human beings and non-human nature).

Thus, one might eventually conclude that, in general, morally appropriate conduct towards non-human nature should focus on paying attention to the many details of the particular case and the consequences of one’s actions. In sum, do no premeditated harm (for example, do not torture animals for fun, restrain large-scale livestock farming), preserve nature wherever it is possible (by, for example, avoiding water and air pollution and protecting tropical rainforests from clearing). As Hans Jonas famously put it, be responsible in your dealings with non-human nature.

5. Theory in Bioethics

a. Introduction

Bioethics is an important inter-disciplinary and rapidly emerging field of applied ethics. The traditional but deficient view concerning ethical reasoning and decision making in applied ethics is that one simply “applies” a particular ethical theory such as utilitarianism or deontology in a given context such as business (business ethics), politics (political ethics), or issues related to human health (medical ethics) in order to solve the moral problem in question. This top-down approach of ethical reasoning and decision making adheres to the idea that ethics is quite similar to geometry, in that it presupposes a solid foundation from which principles and general rules can be inferred and then applied to concrete cases independent of the details of the particular case. The locus of certitude, that is, the place of the greatest certainty for principle ethics---approaches using one master principle---concerns its foundation; the reasonableness of the ethical decision is passed on from the foundation itself.

This picture is awry. In the twentieth century it was clearly shown that the traditional ethical theories had great difficulty in solving the new contemporary problems such as nuclear power and its radioactive waste, issues related to the new biotechnologies (for example, genetic enhancement, cloning), and so on. The consequences were, first, that the two main classical theories in principle ethics---deontology and utilitarianism---were modified in order to deal more properly and successfully with the new situation. For example, Christine Korsgaard modified Kantianism and Richard Hare modified utilitarianism. Secondly, new approaches of ethical reasoning and decision making were developed, such as Beauchamp and Childress’s four-principle approach in bioethics and feminist bioethics. Casuistry and virtue ethics---the bottom-up approaches---were rediscovered and refined in order to examine complex bioethical issues. The rise of applied ethics in general and the rise of bioethics in particular has been faced with an overwhelming variety of details and complex circumstances with regard to the rapidly emerging ethical issues against the background of the fast development of new technologies and the process of globalization, accompanied by an awakening of individual autonomy and the rejection of being submissive to authority. Sound ethical approaches in applied ethics must at least fulfill two criteria: (1) They must be consistent and (2) they must be applicable. These are the minimum conditions for any successful ethical theory in applied ethics.

In addition, one might raise the issue of reaching an agreement about what to do in practice against the background of competing moral theories. There is a twofold response to this well-known problem. First, most cases (for example, clinical ethics consultations, commission work, and so forth) reveal that there is a broad consensus among people concerning the results (practical level) but that they---quite often---differ considerably in their justifications at the theoretical level. Secondly, it might well be the case---as some scholars such as Gert and Beauchamp claim---that some people without adhering to moral relativism have equally good reasons about what to do in practice but, nonetheless, still differ about what and why it should be done. Contrary to the first response, the second response is more alarming since the idea that people could have equally good reasons for differing suggestions seems odd, at least at first sight. At second glance, however, moral judgements might not only depend on pure reason alone but are influenced by different cultures, religions, and traditions that would substantiate the claim of different outcomes and justifications. Whether one is, then, necessarily committed to a form of moral relativism can be reasonably questioned since one can still make the convincing distinction between a hard core of moral norms that is universally shared (for example, that one should not commit murder or lie and that one should help people in need) and other moral norms which are non-universal by nature. If that is correct, then this would solve the issue of moral relativism.

The following brief depiction of (bio)ethical theories, including their main points of criticism, provides an overview of the  approaches (see also Düwell and Steigleder 2003: 41-210; Kuhse and Singer 2009: 65-125).

b. Deontological Approaches

Deontological approaches such as provided by Kant (1785) and Ross (1930) are commonly characterized by applying usually strict moral rules or norms to concrete cases. Religious approaches, such as those of the Catholic Church, and non-religious deontological approaches, such as Kantian-oriented theories, are prime examples of applying moral rules. For example, the (extreme) conservative position of the Catholic Church justifies that one should not abort fetuses, under any circumstances, including in cases of rape (Noonan 1970) and forbids the use of condoms. Furthermore, the Catholic Church regularly defends its strict religious position in end-of-life cases to prolong human life as long as possible and not to practice euthanasia (or physician-assisted suicide) because human life is sacred and given as a gift from God. In this respect, religious approaches are necessarily faced with the objection of speciesism, if they claim that it is sufficient to be a member of the human species in order to be protected. Kantian-oriented approaches, instead, are not necessarily faced with this objection because---at least, in the original version---moral status is assigned according to “rationality” and not according to “membership of the human species”. Other Neo-Kantian deontological approaches, however, might emphasize “human dignity” and hence run into serious troubles with regard to the objection of speciesism as well. In other words, there is a fundamental disagreement inherent in the notion of human dignity---roughly, the idea that there is something special about human beings---and the ascription of moral status to non-human nature such as animals and plants.

Kantian-oriented deontological approaches (or Kantianism) generally adhere to the basic Kantian ideas of respect for persons and human dignity; both central ideas are rooted in the human being’s capacity to act autonomously. Kantianism has been adopted in order to provide a justification for strict truth telling in medical contexts, for example, in cases of terminal cancer, bedside rationing, and medical experiments. This development can be seen as a counter-movement against previous malpractice. The former practice consisted in not telling the truth to the patient in order either not to cause additional harm or not to undermine the goals of the medical experiments (for example, the Tuskegee Syphilis Study). In the late 20th century, this has changed by virtue of acknowledging the patient's right to be told the truth about his or her health condition. Likewise, regarding the patient’s involvement in research studies---including research with placebos---in order to enable the patient to make adequate autonomous decisions (that is, individual informed consent). The second formula of Kant’s Categorical Imperative---“Act in such a way that you treat humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, never merely as a means to an end, but always at the same time as an end” (Kant 1785/1968)---has been successfully used in different medical contexts in order to avoid abuses. In particular, it is nowadays used to avoid abuses in research experiments on human subjects. The sad examples of the Tuskegee Syphilis Study and the Human Radiation Experiments clearly show the dangers of researchers acting in a highly dubious and immoral way (see, The Belmont Report 1979). Additionally, deontological approaches have been used in the fields of animal ethics (Regan 1983, Korsgaard 1996, 2004, Wood 1998) and environmental ethics (Taylor 1986, Korsgaard 1996). Altman (2011) offers a thorough examination of the strengths and weaknesses of Kant’s ethics concerning a vast range of important bioethical issues in contemporary applied ethics.

Genuine religious approaches are problematic by virtue of their strong commitment to religious presuppositions such as the existence of God as the ultimate source of morality or the absolute sacredness of the human life. In modern---or rather secular---societies, this line of reasoning cannot be taken as a universal starting point to justify moral norms for religious and non-religious people alike in medical contexts on issues such as abortion, euthanasia, the use of contraceptives, and genetic enhancement. Despite the prima facie reasonableness of Kantian-oriented deontological approaches in cases concerning truth telling and in the context of medical exploitation, they particularly suffer from using moral norms too general and abstract  to be applied without difficulty or stiltedness to concrete cases. The upshot is that deontological approaches are less effective at providing adequate guidance since their application is too complex and possibly misleading (for a different view, see Altman 2011) or causes strong counter-intuitive intuitions in the case of religious positions.

c. Utilitarianism

One of the most prominent and influential ways of ethical reasoning and decision making in the field of bioethics is based on utilitarianism. In the late twentieth century, utilitarian approaches were so influential that many people outside academia believed that all bioethicists were utilitarians. Utilitarianism, in fact, contains a wide range of different approaches, but one can distinguish four important core elements that all utilitarian approaches have in common:

  1. The consequence principle: The consequences of a given action are the measure of its moral quality.
  2. The utility principle: The moral rightness and wrongness of actions are determined by the greatest possible utility for the greatest possible number of all sentient beings.
  3. The hedonistic principle: The consequences of a given action are evaluated with reference to a particular value. This particular prime value can be as follows: (1) Promoting pleasure, or (2) avoiding pain, or (3) satisfaction of interests or considered preferences, or (4) satisfaction of some objective criteria of well-being, and so forth.
  4. The universal principle: Maximize the total utility for all sentient beings affected.

Utilitarian approaches in bioethics were spearheaded by Singer (1979) and Harris (1975) and carried on by, among others, Savulescu (2001, 2002) and Schüklenk (2010). Such approaches in bioethics are less concerned with public welfare than other vital aspects, such as: (1) debunking the traditional religious views on the sacredness of human beings, the prohibition of abortion, infanticide, and euthanasia; (2) stressing the importance of non-rational sentient animals (animal ethics) and the preservation of nature (environmental ethics) against anthropocentric approaches such as Kantianism and religious approaches; (3) arguing against the use of human rights and human dignity in bioethical discourses; (4) maximizing the patient’s well-being or best interests in medicine. In this context, utilitarians claim that one should focus on the patient avoiding pain and suffering, and therefore one should, for example, allow terminally ill patients to obtain physician-assisted suicide. Furthermore, the religious idea that human life is sacred and hence must be protected from the moment of conception is rejected by utilitarians who believe that religious claims are unsubstantiated and incompatible with the requirements of a modern, secular nation-state (for example, research on human embryos and genetic enhancement should be made possible). In addition, abortion and infanticide in cases where the baby has a severe disability should be possible depending on the circumstances of the particular case and by appealing to the idea of personhood (Singer 1979, Kuhse and Singer 1985, Giubilini and Minerva 2012). According to Singer, one should not be allowed to kill a human being or sentient animal if one can detect in that being rationality and self-consciousness---the core elements of personhood according to Singer. To treat sentient animals with interests differently than human beings is speciesism which is comparable to sexism and racism and must be avoided. Moral judgements, according to utilitarians, should always be impartial and universal. Singer (1975) additionally claims that human beings must consider the equal interests of human beings and animals alike.

The general idea to always maximize the patient’s well-being according to a rather simplistic idea of calculating and comparing the pleasures and pains of all affected persons seems questionable to many people since they do not think that the outcome of these calculations necessarily leads to morally right or wrong actions. Furthermore, the claim that the killing of an innocent being in the case of a fetus with a (severe) disability might be the best possible outcome in some situations---by adhering to “the good life” doctrine---seems to undermine some important values of living together (compassion, care, responsibility for the weak, justice). In addition, the idea that minority groups such as people with (severe) disabilities and patients in a permanent vegetative state can be legitimately sacrificed in some cases has led to a rather bad reputation for utilitarian approaches. Utilitarians are also at odds with approaches in bioethics that appeal to human dignity and human rights. Two centuries ago, Bentham famously stated that natural rights (or human rights) are “nonsense upon stilts,” a dictum most utilitarians still regard as reasonable.

d. The Four-Principle Approach

One of the most important approaches in bioethics or medical ethics is the four-principle approach developed by Tom Beauchamp and James Childress (1978, latest edition 2009). Since then they have continually refined their approach and integrated the points of criticism raised by their opponents, most notably Gert et al. (1990). The four-principle approach, often simply called principlism, consists of four universal prima facie mid-level ethical principles: (1) autonomy, (2) non-maleficence, (3) beneficence, and (4) justice. Together with some general rules and ethical virtues, they can be seen as the starting point and constraining framework of ethical reasoning and decision making (“common morality”). According to Beauchamp and Childress:

The common morality is the set of norms shared by all persons committed to morality. The common morality is not merely a morality, in contrast to other moralities. The common morality is applicable to all persons in all places, and we rightly judge all human conduct by its standards. (2009: 3)

Particular moralities, instead, contain non-universal moral norms which stem from different cultural, religious, and institutional sources. These norms---unlike the abstract and content-thin principles of the common morality---are concrete and rich in substance. Beauchamp and Childress use the methods of specification and balancing to enrich the abstract and content-thin universal principles with empirical data from the particular moralities. The method of specification is, according to Beauchamp,

...a methodological tool that adds content to abstract principles, ridding them of their indeterminateness and providing action-guiding content for the purpose of coping with complex cases. Many already specified norms will need further specification to handle new circumstances of indeterminateness and conflict. (Beauchamp 2011: 301)

The method of balancing, instead, is important for reaching sound judgements in individual cases and it can be seen as “the process of finding reasons to support beliefs about which moral norms should prevail” (Beauchamp and Childress 2009: 20). Since the particular moralities are different, people sometimes specify and balance the principles differently, and hence principlists often claim “that there can be different and equally good solutions to moral problems” (Gordon et al. 2011: 299).

Even though the four-principle approach certainly belongs to the most prevalent, authoritative, and widely used bioethical approaches, this approach has not been unquestioned and has provoked serious objections. The three most important objections are: first, the lack of ethical guidance because there is no master principle in cases of conflict among the principles (Gert et al. 1990); secondly, the problem of bias concerning the universal principles in cross-cultural contexts (Takala 2001, Westra et al. 2009, Gordon 2011), and thirdly, the objection that the four-principle approach is a mere checklist of considerations and so methodologically unsound (Gert et al. 1990).

e. Virtue Ethics

The revival of virtue ethics in moral philosophy in the last century was most notably spearheaded by Anscombe (1958), MacIntyre (1981), Williams (1985), Nussbaum (1988, 1990), and more recently Hursthouse (1987, 1999), Slote (2001), Swanton (2003), and Oakley (2009). This approach also deeply influenced the ethical reasoning and decision making in the field of bioethics, particularly in medical ethics (for example, Foot 1977, Shelp 1985, Hursthouse 1991, Pellegrino 1995, Pellegrino and Thomasma 2003, McDougall 2007).

The general idea of virtue ethical approaches in bioethics is that one should act in accordance with what the virtuous agent would have chosen. In more detail, an action is morally right if it is done by adhering to the ethical virtues in order to promote human flourishing and well-being; the action is morally good if the person in question acts on the basis of the right motive as well as his or her action is based on a firm and good character or disposition. That means an action that is morally right (for instance, to help the needy) but performed according to the wrong motive (such as to gain honour and reputation) is not morally good. The right action and the right motive must both come together in virtue ethics. For a detailed view of how contemporary virtue ethics focuses on action and the rightness of action against the background of the general idea of living a good life, see in particular Hursthouse (1999: chapters 1-3), Swanton (2003: chapter 11), and Slote (2001: chapter 1).

Generally speaking, virtue ethical approaches put a lot of weight on the particular agent. For example, the virtuous physician in medical ethics should not only be a well trained and conscientious professional---one who shows compassion towards his or her patients, is helpful and honest, and keeps his or her promises---but also should be strongly inclined to promote the patient’s well-being even at his or her own expense (Pellegrino 1989). The virtuous agent in bioethics knows how to deal with complex cases, shows a greater sensitivity than proponents of deontological and utilitarian approaches, and acts virtuously not only by complying with moral norms but also “going the extra mile” to perform supererogatory actions. Virtue ethical approaches have been applied in medical ethics by, for example, Foot on euthanasia (1977), Lebacqz on the virtuous patient (1985), Hursthouse on abortion (1991), Oakley and Cocking on professional roles (2001), and Holland on virtue politics (2011). The role of virtue ethics in the field of environmental ethics has been examined by Frasz (1993) and Hursthouse (2007), and in the field of animal ethics by Hursthouse (2011) and Merriam (2011).

It is a matter of debate (see for example, Kihlbom 2000, Holland 2011), whether the strengths of virtue ethical approaches are limited to single cases (individual level) or whether they are also equally good candidates in cases of developing biomedical procedures for regulatory policy (societal level). In addition, Jansen (2000), for example, argues that virtue ethical approaches face two serious problems, which cannot be sufficiently resolved by adhering to virtue ethics. First is the problem of content: vague virtues are unable to give proper guidance. Second is the problem of pluralism: competing conceptions of the good life complicate a sound solution. Virtues only have a limited function; for example, in the context of medicine they should enable the physician to become a virtuous practitioner abiding by the right motive. But, even in this case, Jansen claims that the right action should prevail over the right motive. Furthermore, sometimes opponents such as Jansen (2000) claim that virtues are relative by nature and hence lack proper guidance in the context of global bioethics (the “problem of cultural relativity”). However, Nussbaum (1988) argues persuasively, by appealing to Aristotle, that ethical virtues are non-relative by nature and allow for variations.

f. Casuistry

The revival of casuistry as an inductive method of ethical reasoning and decision making in the second half of the twentieth century coincides with a wide and persistent critique of principle-oriented approaches, most notably principlism, deontological ethics, and utilitarianism in bioethics. Casuistry had its historical heyday in moral theology and ethics during the period from the fifteenth to the seventeenth century in Europe. After a long time of no importance or influence in moral philosophy, it gained a significant importance in bioethics---mostly in clinical ethics---after the vital publications of Jonsen and Toulmin (1988), Strong (1988), and Brody (1988). Casuists attack the traditional idea of simply applying universal moral rules and norms to complex cases in order to solve the problem in question---that is, a moral theory justifies a moral principle (or several principles) which in turn justifies a moral rule (or several rules) which in turn justifies the moral judgement concerning a particular case. The circumstances make the case and are of utmost importance in order to yield a good solution (see moral particularism).

Whether the casuists’ solution always leads to an open-and-shut case appears questionable and depends largely on the paradigm cases and analogies that are used to determine and evaluate the case in question as well as the skills of the particular casuist (in finding proper paradigm cases and analogies, and so on.). For example, Strong (1988) claims that it might be that a complex case lies right in between two reference cases and hence one is unable to find a clear solution; in such a case different solutions might be equally justified. In general, casuists argue that universal principles and rules are unable to solve complex cases in a sufficient way since the complexity of the moral life is too great (for example, Toulmin 1982, Brody 1988). The general strategy in casuistry can be described as follows:

  1. Depiction of the case: A thorough depiction of the empirical and moral elements of the given case lays out the basic structure and the decisive problems. Vital questions are: (a) What are the particulars of the case (who, what, where, when, how much)? (b) What are the basic questions in the relevant area (in medical ethics: what are the medical indications, what are the patient’s preferences, evaluating the quality of life, consider and respect the context of the treatment)?
  2. Classification of the case: Once the given case is thoroughly depicted, one must classify the case by finding paradigm cases and  analogies by analogical reasoning. Paradigm cases and analogies function as the background against which the given case is evaluated. They help to determine the important similarities and differences of the specifics of the case.
  3. Moral judgement: Once the specific similarities and differences of the case are determined, the casuists evaluate the results by adhering to common sense morality and the basic values of the community.

Case sensitivity and the (partial) integration of cultural and community bound values and expectations are, in general, advantageous in ethical reasoning and decision making. But it seems equally true that this approach presents some difficulties as well. As critics such as Arras (1991), Wildes (1993), and Tomlinson (1994) have argued, it is impossible to take a critical standpoint if one is deeply rooted in one’s own tradition, value system, and social community, since it can be the case that the social practices and convictions are simply biased (Kopelman 1994) or unjust according to an external standpoint (Apartheid in South Africa, the caste system in India). Furthermore, casuistry seems to presuppose a widespread agreement on basic values in the community and, therefore, is doomed to failure in pluralistic cultures (Wildes 1993). Finally, casuistry may have difficulty providing solutions to rather general bioethical regulatory policies since it is completely focused on cases. Whether a series of similar cases may warrant a particular regulatory practice from a casuistical point of view is a matter of debate (see virtue ethics), but it seems fair to say that the very meaning of casuistry really concerns cases and not general rules which can be adopted as binding regulations.

g. Feminist Bioethics

Feminist bioethics can only be fully appreciated if one understands the context in which this increasingly important approach evolved during the late twentieth century (Tong 1993, Wolf 1996, Donchin and Purdy 1999, Rawlinson 2001). The social and political background of feminist bioethics is feminism and feminist theory with its major social and political goal to end the oppression of women and to empower them to become an equal gender. The apparent differences between men and women have often led cultures to treat them in radically different ways, ways that often disadvantage women. Thus women have been allocated to social roles that leave them worse off with respect to benefits enjoyed by men, such as freedom and power. Yet despite their differences in reproductive roles, women and men share many morally relevant characteristics such as rationality and the capacity for suffering, and hence deserve fundamental equality.

In more detail, the most important task in the long struggle regarding the goals of feminism was to combine two distinct features that were both vital in order to fight against traditional power relations. That is, the idea that men and women are equal and different at the same time. They are equal by virtue of gender equality and different because the proponents stress a particular feminist perspective. The combination of both aspects is, in general, a difficult task for feminist ethics since, on the one hand, the proponents must avoid the common trap of speaking in traditional dualistic ways of care versus justice, particularity versus universality, and emotion versus reason and, on the other hand, they must carve out the specific differences of the feminist perspective (Haker 2003). Historically speaking, feminist ethics developed in strong opposition to the traditional male-oriented approaches which genuinely appealed to universal moral rights and principles, such as principlism, deontological approaches and utilitarianism (Gilligan 1982, Gudorf 1994, Lebacqz 1995). Feminist ethics, instead, is construed differently by adhering to a context-sensitive and particularist ethics of care as well as by appealing to core values such as responsibility, relational autonomy, care, compassion, freedom, and equality (Gilligan 1982, Noddings 1984, Jagger 1992). The ethics of care, however, is a necessary but not sufficient depiction of feminist ethics since the latter has, in general, become more refined and sophisticated with its different branches (Tong 1989, Cole and Coultrap-McQuin 1992).

Feminist bioethics developed from the early 1970s on and was initially focused on medical ethics (Holmes and Purdy 1992, Warren 1992, Tong 1997); proponents later extended the areas of interest to issues in the fields of animal and environmental ethics (Plumwood 1986, Warren, 1987, Mies and Shiva 1995, Donovan 2008). Important topics in feminist bioethics are concerned with the correct understanding of autonomy as relational autonomy (Sherwin 1992, 1998, Mackenzie and Stoljar 2000, Donchin 2001), a strong focus on care (Kittay 1999), the claim for an equal and just treatment of women in order to fight against discrimination within healthcare professions and institutions on many different levels (Miles 1991, Tong 2002). In more detail, from a feminist perspective the following bioethical issues are of great importance: abortion, reproductive medicine, justice and care, pre-implantation genetic diagnosis, sex selection, exploitation and abuse of women, female genital circumcision, breast cancer, contraception and HIV, equal access to (and quality of) healthcare and healthcare resources, global bioethics and cultural issues. The main line of reasoning is to make a well informed ethical decision which is not gender biased and to appeal to important core values. Feminist bioethics is by nature particularistic and in this respect it is similar to many virtue ethical approaches and casuistry.

Without any doubt, feminist bioethics initiated discussion of important topics, provided valuable insights, and caused a return to a more meaningful way of ethical reasoning and decision making by, for example, not only adhering to universal moral norms. On the other hand, it can be doubted whether feminist bioethics---all things considered---can be seen as a well-equipped and full moral theory. It may be that feminist bioethics complements the traditional ethical theories by adding an important and new perspective (that is, the feminist standpoint) to the debate. Several vital methodological topics still need to be clarified in more detail and put into a broader moral context---such as how to avoid the traditional dualistic way of speaking about things and at the same time stressing a particular feminist standpoint; the problem of loyalty towards family and close friends and impartiality in ethics (universalism versus particularism); and feminist bioethics and the global perspective. Developing feminist bioethics is on the agenda of many scholars working in the fields of virtue ethics and casuistry. Thus, feminist bioethics comes in for the standard objections raised by the opponents of virtue ethics and casuistry alike. Therefore, it must also defend itself against some of the above-mentioned objections that are not peculiar to feminist bioethics. To sum up, feminist bioethics adds valuable insights to debates on various bioethical topics, but may not be a well-equipped full moral theory yet.

6. References and Further Reading

a. References

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  • Baker, R. (1998). A Theory of International Bioethics: The Negotiable and Non-Negotiable, Kennedy Institute of Ethics Journal, 8(3), 233-273.
  • Beauchamp, T.L. (2011). Making Principlism Practical, Bioethics, 25(6), 301-303.
  • Beauchamp, T.L. & Childress, J.F. (1979). Principles of Biomedical Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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  • Holland, S. (2011). The Virtue Ethics Approach to Bioethics, Bioethics, 25(4), 192-201.
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  • Hursthouse, R. (2011). Virtue Ethics and the Treatment of Animals. In: T.L. Beauchamp & R.G. Frey (Eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Animal Ethics. New York: Oxford University Press, 119-143.
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b. Further Reading

  • Boylan, M. (2013). Medical Ethics, 2nd ed., Malden, MA and Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Held, V. (1995). Justice and Care: Essential Readings in Feminist Ethics. Boulder and Oxford: Westview Press.
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  • Muller, C.F. (1990). Health Care and Gender. New York: Russel Sage Foundation.
  • Overall, C. (1987). Ethics and Human Reproduction: A Feminist Analysis. Boston: Allen & Unwin.
  • Purdy, L. (1996). Reproducing Persons. Issues in Feminist Bioethics. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
  • Scully, D. (1980). Men Who Control Women’s Health: The Miseducation of Obstetrician-Gynecologists. Boston: Houghton Mifflin.
  • Thomson, J. (1971). A Defense of Abortion, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 1(1), 47-66.
  • Todd, A.D. (1989). Intimate adversaries: cultural conflict between doctors and women patients. Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • Tong, R., Anderson, G. & Santos, A. (2001). Globalizing Feminist Bioethics. Crosscultural Perspectives. Boulder: Westview Press.

Author Information

John-Stewart Gordon
University of Cologne, Germany
Vytautas Magnus University, Lithuania

Plato: The Republic

PlatoSince the mid-nineteenth century, the Republic has been Plato’s most famous and widely read dialogue.  As in most other Platonic dialogues the main character is Socrates.  It is generally accepted that the Republic belongs to the dialogues of Plato’s middle period.  In Plato’s early dialogues, Socrates refutes the accounts of his interlocutors and the discussion ends with no satisfactory answer to the matter investigated.  In the Republic however, we encounter Socrates developing a position on justice and its relation to eudaimonia (happiness).  He provides a long and complicated, but unified argument, in defense of the just life and its necessary connection to the happy life.

The dialogue explores two central questions.  The first question is “what is justice?”  Socrates addresses this question both in terms of political communities and in terms of the individual person or soul.  He does this to address the second and driving question of the dialogue: “is the just person happier than the unjust person?” or “what is the relation of justice to happiness?” Given the two central questions of the discussion, Plato’s philosophical concerns in the dialogue are ethical and political.  In order to address these two questions, Socrates and his interlocutors construct a just city in speech, the Kallipolis.  They do this in order to explain what justice is and then they proceed to illustrate justice by analogy in the human soul.  On the way to defending the just life, Socrates considers a tremendous variety of subjects such as several rival theories of justice, competing views of human happiness, education, the nature and importance of philosophy and philosophers, knowledge, the structure of reality, the Forms, the virtues and vices, good and bad souls, good and bad political regimes, the family, the role of women in society, the role of art in society, and even the afterlife.  This wide scope of the dialogue presents various interpretative difficulties and has resulted in thousands of scholarly works.  In order to attempt to understand the dialogue’s argument as a whole one is required to grapple with these subjects.

Table of Contents

  1. Synopsis of the Republic
    1. Book I
    2. Book II
    3. Book III
    4. Book IV
    5. Book V
    6. Book VI
    7. Book VII
    8. Book VIII
    9. Book IX
    10. Book X
  2. Ethics or Political Philosophy?
  3. The Analogy of the City and the Soul
  4. Plato’s Defense of Justice
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Standard Greek Text
    2. English Translations
    3. General Discussions of the Republic
    4. Discussions on Plato’s Ethics and Political Philosophy
    5. Discussions on the City/Soul Analogy.
    6. Discussions of Plato’s Defense of Justice in the Republic
    7. Discussions of Political Measures Introduced in the Just City
      1. Discussions of the Role of Women in the Just City
      2. Discussions of Poetry in the Just City
      3. Discussions on the Soul in the Republic
      4. Discussions on Plato’s Moral Psychology in the Republic

1. Synopsis of the Republic

a. Book I

Socrates and Glaucon visit the Piraeus to attend a festival in honor of the Thracian goddess Bendis (327a).  They are led to Polemarchus’ house (328b).  Socrates speaks to Cephalus about old age, the benefits of being wealthy, and justice (328e-331d). One would not claim that it is just to return weapons one owes to a mad friend (331c), thus justice is not being truthful and returning what one owes as Cephalus claims.  The discussion between Socrates and Polemarchus follows (331d-336b).

Polemarchus claims that justice is helping one’s friends and harming one’s enemies and that this is what one owes people (332c).  Socrates’ objections to Polemarchus’ definition are as follows: (i) Is this appropriate in medicine or cooking?  So in what context is this the case? (332d)? (ii) The just person will also be good at useless things and at being unjust (333e). (iii) We often do not know who our friends and enemies are. Thus, we may treat those whom we only think are our friends or enemies well or badly.  Would this be justice? (334c). (iv) It does not seem to be just to treat anyone badly, not even an enemy (335b).  Discussion between Socrates and Thrasymachus follows (336b-354c).

Thrasymachus defines justice as the advantage or what is beneficial to the stronger (338c).  Justice is different under different political regimes according to the laws, which are made to serve the interests of the strong (the ruling class in each regime, 338e-339a).  Socrates requires clarification of the definition: does it mean that justice is what the stronger think is beneficial to them or what is actually beneficial to them (339b)?  And don’t the strong rulers make mistakes and sometimes create laws that do not serve their advantage (339c)?  Thrasymachus points out that the stronger are really only those who do not make mistakes as to what is to their advantage (340d).  Socrates responds with a discussion of art or craft and points out that its aim is to do what is good for its subjects, not what is good for the practitioner (341c).  Thrasymachus suggests that some arts, such as that of shepherds, do not do this but rather aim at the advantage of the practitioner (343c). He also adds the claim that injustice is in every way better than justice and that the unjust person who commits injustice undetected is always happier than the just person (343e-344c).  The paradigm of the happy unjust person is the tyrant who is able to satisfy all his desires (344a-b).  Socrates points out that the shepherd’s concern for his sheep is different from his concern to make money, which is extraneous to the art (345c) and that no power or art provides what is beneficial to itself (346e).  Socrates claims that the best rulers are reluctant to rule but do so out of necessity: they do not wish to be ruled by someone inferior (347a-c).

Socrates offers three argument in favor of the just life over the unjust life: (i) the just man is wise and good, and the unjust man is ignorant and bad (349b); (ii) injustice produces internal disharmony which prevents effective actions (351b); (iii) virtue is excellence at a thing’s function and the just person lives a happier life than the unjust person, since he performs the various functions of the human soul well (352d).  Socrates is dissatisfied with the discussion since an adequate account of justice is necessary before they can address whether the just life is better than the unjust life (354b).

b. Book II

Glaucon is not persuaded by the arguments in the previous discussion (357a).  He divides good things into three classes: things good in themselves, things good both in themselves and for their consequences, and things good only for their consequences (357b-d).  Socrates places justice in the class of things good in themselves and for their consequences.

Glaucon renews Thrasymachus’ argument to challenge Socrates to defend justice by itself without any consideration of what comes from it (358b ff.).  Glaucon gives a speech defending injustice: (i) justice originates as a compromise between weak people who are afraid that suffering injustice is worse than doing it (358e-359a);  (ii) people act justly because this is necessary and unavoidable, so justice is good only for its consequences (story of the ring of Gyges’ ancestor, 359c-360d); (iii) the unjust person with the reputation for justice is happier than the just person with the reputation for injustice (360d-362c).

Adeimantus expands Glaucon’s defense of injustice and attack on justice by asserting: the reputation of justice is better than justice itself, so the unjust person who is able to keep the reputation of being just will be happier than the just person; discussion of various ways that the unjust can acquire the reputation for justice (362d-366d).

Socrates is asked to defend justice for itself, not for the reputation it allows for (367b).  He proposes to look for justice in the city first and then to proceed by analogy to find justice in the individual (368c-369a).  This approach will allow for a clearer judgment on the question of whether the just person is happier than the unjust person.  Socrates begins by discussing the origins of political life and constructs a just city in speech that satisfies only basic human necessities (369b-372c).  Socrates argues that humans enter political life since each is not self-sufficient by nature.  Each human has certain natural abilities (370a) and doing only the single job one is naturally suited for, is the most efficient way to satisfy the needs of all the citizens (370c).  Glaucon objects that Socrates’ city is too simple and calls it “a city of pigs” (372d).  Socrates describes a city that allows for luxuries (“a feverish city,” 372e-373e).  Socrates points out that the luxurious city will require an army to guard the city (373e).  The army will be composed of professional soldiers, the guardians, who, like dogs, must be gentle to fellow citizens and harsh to enemies (375c).  The guardians need to be educated very carefully to be able to do their job of protecting the city’s citizens, laws, and customs well (376d).  Poetry and stories need to be censored to guarantee such an education (377b).  Poetry should: (i) present the gods as good and only as causes of good (379a); (ii) as unchanging in form (380d); (iii) as beings who refrain from lies and deception (381e).

c. Book III

Socrates continues the political measures of the censorship of poetry: (iv) the underworld should not be portrayed as a bad place so that the guardians will not be too afraid of death (386b); (v) the heroes and gods should not be presented lamenting so that the guardians can develop courage (387e); (vi) poetry should prevent people from laughing violently (388e); (vii) poetry should promote the guardian’s sense of truth-telling but with the willingness to lie when this is conducive to the good of the city (389b); (viii) it should promote self-discipline and obedience (389c-d); (ix) it should not include stories that contribute to avarice (390d); (x) it should not include stories that contribute to hubris or impiety (391a).  Socrates moves on to discuss the manner in which stories should be told (392d).  He divides such manners into simple narration (in third person) and imitative narration (in first person, 392d).  To keep the guardians doing only their job, Socrates argues that the guardians may imitate only what is appropriate for this (394e-395d).  The just city should allow only modes and rhythms that fit the content of poetry allowed in the just city (398b-399c).  Socrates explains how good art can lead to the formation of good character and make people more likely to follow their reason (400e-402c).  Socrates turns to the physical education of the guardians and says that it should include physical training that prepares them for war, a careful diet, and habits that contribute to the avoidance of doctors (403c-405b).  Physical education should be geared to benefit the soul rather than the body, since the body necessarily benefits when the soul is in a good condition, whereas the soul does not necessarily benefit when the body is in a good condition (410b-c).

Socrates begins to describe how the rulers of the just city are to be selected from the class of the guardians: they need to be older, strong, wise, and wholly unwilling to do anything other than what is advantageous to the city (412b-414b).  Socrates suggests that they need to tell the citizens a myth that should be believed by subsequent generations in order for everyone to accept his position in the city (414b-415d).  The myth of metals portrays each human as having a precious metal in them: those naturally suited to be rulers have gold, those suited to be guardians have silver, and those suited for farming and the other crafts have bronze.

Socrates proceeds to discuss the living and housing conditions of the guardians: they will not have private property, they will have little privacy, they will receive what they need from the city via taxation of the other classes, and they will live communally and have common messes (415e-416e).

d. Book IV

Adeimantus complains that the guardians in the just city will not be very happy (419a).  Socrates points out that the aim is to make the whole city, and not any particular class, as happy as possible (420b).  Socrates discusses several other measures for the city as a whole in order to accomplish this.  There should be neither too much wealth nor too much poverty in the city since these cause social strife (421d-422a).  The just city should be only as large in size as would permit it to be unified and stable (423b).  Socrates reemphasizes the importance of the guardian’s education and suggests that the guardians will possess wives and children in common (423e). He suggests that they should only allow very limited ways by which innovations may be introduced to education or change in the laws (424b-425e).  The just city will follow traditional Greek religious customs (427b).

With the founding of the just city completed, Socrates proceeds to discuss justice (427d).  He claims that the city they have founded is completely good and virtuous and thus it is wise, courageous, moderate, and just (427e).  Justice will be what remains once they find the other three virtues in it, namely wisdom, courage, and moderation (428a).  The wisdom of the just city is found in its rulers and it is the type of knowledge that allows them to rule the city well (428b-d).  The courage of the just city is found in its military and it is correct and lawful belief about what to fear and what not to fear (429a-430b).  The city’s moderation or self-discipline is its unanimity in following the just city’s structure in terms of who should rule and who should be ruled (430d-432a).  The city’s justice consists in each class performing its proper function (433a-b).

Socrates then proceeds to find the corresponding four virtues in the individual (434d).  Socrates defends the analogy of the city and the individual (435a-b) and proceeds to distinguish three analogous parts in the soul with their natural functions (436b).  By using instances of psychological conflict, he distinguishes the function of the rational part from that of the appetitive part of the soul (439a).  Then he distinguishes the function of the spirited part from the functions of the two other parts (439e-440e).  The function of the rational part is thinking, that of the spirited part the experience of emotions, and that of the appetitive part the pursuit of bodily desires.  Socrates explains the virtues of the individual’s soul and how they correspond to the virtues of the city (441c-442d).  Socrates points out that one is just when each of the three parts of the soul performs its function (442d).  Justice is a natural balance of the soul’s parts and injustice is an imbalance of the parts of the soul (444e).  Socrates is now ready to answer the question of whether justice is more profitable than injustice that goes unpunished (444e-445a).  To do so he will need to examine the various unjust political regimes and the corresponding unjust individuals in each (445c-e).

e. Book V

Socrates is about to embark on a discussion of the unjust political regimes and the corresponding unjust individuals when he is interrupted by Adeimantus and Polemarchus (449a-b).  They insist that he needs to address the comment he made earlier that the guardians will possess the women and the children of the city in common (449b-d).  Socrates reluctantly agrees (450a-451b) and begins with the suggestion that the guardian women should perform the same job as the male guardians (451c-d).  Some may follow convention and object that women should be given different jobs because they differ from men by nature (453a-c). Socrates responds by indicating that the natural differences between men and women are not relevant when it comes to the jobs of protecting and ruling the city.  Both sexes are naturally suited for these tasks (454d-e).  Socrates goes on to argue that the measure of allowing the women to perform the same tasks as the men in this way is not only feasible but also best.  This is the case since the most suited people for the job will be performing it (456c).

Socrates also proposes that there should be no separate families among the members of the guardian class: the guardians will possess all the women and children in common (457c-d).  Socrates proceeds to discuss how this measure is for the best and Glaucon allows him to skip discussing its feasibility (458a-c).  The best guardian men are to have sex with the best guardian women to produce offspring of a similar nature (458d-459d).    Socrates describes the system of eugenics in more detail.  In order to guarantee that the best guardian men have sex with the best guardian women, the city will have marriage festivals supported by a rigged lottery system (459e-460a).  The best guardian men will also be allowed to have sex with as many women as they desire in order to increase the likelihood of giving birth to children with similar natures (460a-b).  Once born, the children will be taken away to a rearing pen to be taken care of by nurses and the parents will not be allowed to know who their own children are (460c-d).  This is so that the parents think of all the children as their own.  Socrates recognizes that this system will result in members of the same family having intercourse with each other (461c-e).

Socrates proceeds to argue that these arrangements will ensure that unity spreads throughout the city (462a-465d).  Responding to Adeimantus’ earlier complaint that the guardians would not be happy, Socrates indicates that the guardians will be happy with their way of life; they will have their needs satisfied and will receive sufficient honor from the city (465d-e).  Thereafter, Socrates discusses how the guardians will conduct war (466e).

Glaucon interrupts him and demands an account explaining how such a just city can come into being (471c-e).  Socrates admits that this is the most difficult criticism to address (472a). Then he explains that the theoretical model of the just city they constructed remains valid for discussing justice and injustice even if they cannot prove that such a city can come to exist (472b-473b).  Socrates claims that the model of the just city cannot come into being until philosophers rule as kings or kings become philosophers (473c-d).  He also points out that this is the only possible route by which to reach complete happiness in both public and private life (473e).  Socrates indicates that they to, discuss philosophy and philosophers to justify these claims (474b-c).  Philosophers love and pursue all of wisdom (475b-c) and they especially love the sight of truth (475e).  Philosophers are the only ones who recognize and find pleasure in what is behind the multiplicity of appearances, namely the single Form (476a-b).  Socrates distinguishes between those who know the single Forms that are and those who have opinions (476d).  Those who have opinions do not know, since opinions have becoming and changing appearances as their object, whereas knowledge implies that the objects thereof are stable (476e-477e).

f. Book VI

Socrates goes on to explain why philosophers should rule the city.  They should do so since they are better able to know the truth and since they have the relevant practical knowledge by which to rule.  The philosopher’s natural abilities and virtues prove that they have what is necessary to rule well: they love what is rather than what becomes (485a-b), they hate falsehood (485c), they are moderate (485d-e), they are courageous (486a-b), they are quick learners (486c), they have a good memory (486c-d), they like proportion since the truth is like it, and they have a pleasant nature (486d-487a).

Adeimantus objects that actual philosophers are either useless or bad people (487a-d).  Socrates responds with the analogy of the ship of state to show that philosophers are falsely blamed for their uselessness (487e-489a).  Like a doctor who does not beg patients to heal them, the philosopher should not plead with people to rule them (489b-c).  To the accusation that philosophers are bad, Socrates responds that those with the philosopher’s natural abilities and with outstanding natures often get corrupted by a bad education and become outstandingly bad (491b-e).  Thus, someone can only be a philosopher in the true sense if he receives the proper kind of education.  After a discussion of the sophists as bad teachers (492a-493c), Socrates warns against various people who falsely claim to be philosophers (495b-c).  Since current political regimes lead to either the corruption or the destruction of the philosopher, he should avoid politics and lead a quiet private life (496c-d).

Socrates then addresses the question of how philosophy can come to play an important role in existing cities (497e).  Those with philosophical natures need to practice philosophy all their lives, especially when they are older (498a-c).  The only way to make sure that philosophy is properly appreciated and does not meet hostility is to wipe an existing city clean and begin it anew (501a).  Socrates concludes that the just city and the measures proposed are both for the best and not impossible to bring about (502c).

Socrates proceeds to discuss the education of philosopher kings (502c-d).  The most important thing philosophers should study is the Form of the Good (505a).  Socrates considers several candidates for what the Good is, such as pleasure and knowledge and he rejects them (505b-d).  He points out that we choose everything with a view to the good (505e).  Socrates attempts to explain what the Form of the Good is through the analogy of the sun (507c-509d).  As the sun illuminates objects so the eye can see them, the Form of the Good renders the objects of knowledge knowable to the human soul.  As the sun provides things with their ability to be, to grow, and with nourishment, the Form of the Good provides the objects of knowledge with their being even though it itself is higher than being (509b).

Socrates offers the analogy of the divided line to explain the Form of the Good even further (509d-511d).  He divides a line into two unequal sections once and then into two unequal sections again.  The lowest two parts represent the visible realm and the top two parts the intelligible realm.  In the first of the four sections of the line, Socrates places images/shadows, in the second section visible objects, in the third section truths arrived at via hypotheses as mathematicians do, and in the last section the Forms themselves.  Corresponding to each of these, there is a capacity of the human soul: imagination, belief, thought, and understanding.  The line also represents degrees of clarity and opacity as the lowest sections are more opaque and the higher sections clearer.

g. Book VII

Socrates continues his discussion of the philosopher and the Forms with a third analogy, the analogy of the cave (514a-517c).  This represents the philosopher’s education from ignorance to knowledge of the Forms.  True education is the turning around of the soul from shadows and visible objects to true understanding of the Forms (518c-d).  Philosophers who accomplish this understanding will be reluctant to do anything other than contemplate the Forms but they must be forced to return to the cave (the city) and rule it.

Socrates proceeds to outline the structure of the philosopher king’s education so that they can reach an understanding of the Forms (521d).  Those who eventually become philosopher kings will initially be educated like the other guardians in poetry, music, and physical education (521d-e).  Then they will receive education in mathematics: arithmetic and number (522c), plane geometry (526c), and solid geometry (528b).  Following these, they will study astronomy (528e), and harmonics (530d).  Then they will study dialectic which will lead them to understand the Forms and the Form of the Good (532a).  Socrates gives a partial explanation of the nature of dialectic and leaves Glaucon with no clear explanation of its nature or how it may lead to understanding (532a-535a).  Then they discuss who will receive this course of education and how long they are to study these subjects (535a-540b).  The ones receiving this type of education need to exhibit the natural abilities suited to a philosopher discussed earlier.  After the training in dialectic the education system will include fifteen years of practical political training (539e-540c) to prepare philosopher kings for ruling the city.  Socrates concludes by suggesting that the easiest way to bring the just city into being would be to expel everyone over the age of ten out of an existing city (540e-541b).

h. Book VIII

Socrates picks up the argument that was interrupted in Book V.  Glaucon remembers that Socrates was about to describe the four types of unjust regime along with their corresponding unjust individuals (543c-544b).  Socrates announces that he will begin discussing the regimes and individual that deviate the least from the just city and individual and proceed to discuss the ones that deviate the most (545b-c).  The cause of change in regime is lack of unity in the rulers (545d).  Assuming that the just city could come into being, Socrates indicates that it would eventually change since everything which comes into being must decay (546a-b).  The rulers are bound to make mistakes in assigning people jobs suited to their natural capacities and each of the classes will begin to be mixed with people who are not naturally suited for the tasks relevant to each class (546e).  This will lead to class conflicts (547a).

The first deviant regime from just kingship or aristocracy will be timocracy, that emphasizes the pursuit of honor rather than wisdom and justice (547d ff.).  The timocratic individual will have a strong spirited part in his soul and will pursue honor, power, and success (549a).  This city will be militaristic.  Socrates explains the process by which an individual becomes timocratic: he listens to his mother complain about his father’s lack of interest in honor and success (549d).  The timocratic individual’s soul is at a middle point between reason and spirit.

Oligarchy arises out of timocracy and it emphasizes wealth rather than honor (550c-e).  Socrates discusses how it arises out of timocracy and its characteristics (551c-552e): people will pursue wealth; it will essentially be two cities, a city of wealthy citizens and a city of poor people; the few wealthy will fear the many poor; people will do various jobs simultaneously; the city will allow for poor people without means; it will have a high crime rate.  The oligarchic individual comes by seeing his father lose his possessions and feeling insecure he begins to greedily pursue wealth (553a-c).  Thus he allows his appetitive part to become a more dominant part of his soul (553c).  The oligarchic individual’s soul is at middle point between the spirited and the appetitive part.

Socrates proceeds penultimately, to discuss democracy.  It comes about when the rich become too rich and the poor too poor (555c-d).  Too much luxury makes the oligarchs soft and the poor revolt against them (556c-e).  In democracy most of the political offices are distributed by lot (557a).  The primary goal of the democratic regime is freedom or license (557b-c).  People will come to hold offices without having the necessary knowledge (557e) and everyone is treated as an equal in ability (equals and unequals alike, 558c). The democratic individual comes to pursue all sorts of bodily desires excessively (558d-559d) and allows his appetitive part to rule his soul.  He comes about when his bad education allows him to transition from desiring money to desiring bodily and material goods (559d-e).  The democratic individual has no shame and no self-discipline (560d).

Tyranny arises out of democracy when the desire for freedom to do what one wants becomes extreme (562b-c).  The freedom or license aimed at in the democracy becomes so extreme that any limitations on anyone’s freedom seem unfair.  Socrates points out that when freedom is taken to such an extreme it produces its opposite, slavery (563e-564a).  The tyrant comes about by presenting himself as a champion of the people against the class of the few people who are wealthy (565d-566a).  The tyrant is forced to commit a number of acts to gain and retain power: accuse people falsely, attack his kinsmen, bring people to trial under false pretenses, kill many people, exile many people, and purport to cancel the debts of the poor to gain their support (565e-566a).  The tyrant eliminates the rich, brave, and wise people in the city since he perceives them as threats to his power (567c).  Socrates indicates that the tyrant faces the dilemma to either live with worthless people or with good people who may eventually depose him and chooses to live with worthless people (567d).  The tyrant ends up using mercenaries as his guards since he cannot trust any of the citizens (567d-e).  The tyrant also needs a very large army and will spend the city’s money (568d-e), and will not hesitate to kill members of his own family if they resist his ways (569b-c).

i. Book IX

Socrates is now ready to discuss the tyrannical individual (571a).  He begins by discussing necessary and unnecessary pleasures and desires (571b-c).  Those with balanced souls ruled by reason are able to keep their unnecessary desires from becoming lawless and extreme (571d-572b).  The tyrannical individual comes out of the democratic individual when the latter’s unnecessary desires and pleasures become extreme; when he becomes full of Eros or lust (572c-573b).  The tyrannical person is mad with lust (573c) and this leads him to seek any means by which to satisfy his desires and to resist anyone who gets in his way (573d-574d).  Some tyrannical individuals eventually become actual tyrants (575b-d).  Tyrants associate themselves with flatterers and are incapable of friendship (575e-576a).  Applying the analogy of the city and the soul, Socrates proceeds to argue that the tyrannical individual is the most unhappy individual (576c ff.).  Like the tyrannical city, the tyrannical individual is enslaved (577c-d), least likely to do what he wants (577d-e), poor and unsatisfiable (579e-578a), fearful and full of wailing and lamenting (578a).  The individual who becomes an actual tyrant of a city is the unhappiest of all (578b-580a).  Socrates concludes this first argument with a ranking of the individuals in terms of happiness: the more just one is the happier (580b-c).

He proceeds to a second proof that the just are happier than the unjust (580d).  Socrates distinguishes three types of persons: one who pursues wisdom, another who pursues honor, and another who pursues profit (579d-581c).  He argues that we should trust the wisdom lover’s judgment in his way of life as the most pleasant, since he is able to consider all three types of life clearly (581c-583a).

Socrates proceeds to offer a third proof that the just are happier than the unjust (583b).  He begins with an analysis of pleasure: relief from pain may seem pleasant (583c) and bodily pleasures are merely a relief from pain but not true pleasure (584b-c).  The only truly fulfilling pleasure is that which comes from understanding since the objects it pursues are permanent (585b-c).  Socrates adds that only if the rational part rules the soul, will each part of the soul find its proper pleasure (586d-587a).  He concludes the argument with a calculation of how many times the best life is more pleasant than the worst: seven-hundred and twenty nine (587a-587e).  Socrates discusses an imaginary multi-headed beast to illustrate the consequences of justice and injustice in the soul and to support justice (588c ff.).

j. Book X

Thereafter, Socrates returns to the subject of poetry and claims that the measures introduced to exclude imitative poetry from the just city seem clearly justified now (595a).  Poetry is to be censored since the poets may not know which is; thus may lead the soul astray (595b).  Socrates proceeds to discuss imitation.  He explains what it is by distinguishing several levels of imitation through the example of a couch: there is the Form of the couch, the particular couch, and a painting of a couch (596a-598b).  The products of imitation are far removed from the truth (597e-598c).  Poets, like painters are imitators who produce imitations without knowledge of the truth (598e-599a).  Socrates argues that if poets had knowledge of the truth they would want to be people who do great things rather than remain poets (599b).  Socrates doubts the poet’s capacity to teach virtue since he only imitates images of it (599c-601a).  The poet’s knowledge is inferior to that of the maker of other products and the maker’s knowledge is inferior to that of the user’s (601c-602b).

Now Socrates considers how imitators affect their audiences (602c).  He uses a comparison with optical illusions (602c) to argue that imitative poetry causes the parts of the soul to be at war with each other and this leads to injustice (603c-605b).  The most serious charge against imitative poetry is that it even corrupts decent people (605c).  He concludes that the just city should not allow such poetry in it but only poetry that praises the gods and good humans (606e-607a).  Imitative poetry prevents the immortal soul from attaining its greatest reward (608c-d).

Glaucon wonders if the soul is immortal and Socrates launches into an argument proving its immortality: things that are destroyed, are destroyed by their own evil; the body’s evil is disease and this can destroy it; the soul’s evils are ignorance, injustice and the other vices but these do not destroy the soul; thus, the soul is immortal (608d-611a).  Socrates points out that we cannot understand the nature of the soul if we only consider its relation to the body as the present discussion has (611b-d).

Socrates finally describes the rewards of justice by first having Glaucon allow that he can discuss the rewards of reputation for justice (612b-d).  Glaucon allows this since Socrates has already defended justice by itself in the soul.  Socrates indicates justice and injustice do not escape the notice of the gods, that the gods love the just and hate the unjust, and that good things come to those whom the gods love (612e-613a).  Socrates lists various rewards for the just and punishments for the unjust in this life (613a-e).  He proceeds to tell the Myth of Er that is supposed to illustrate reward and punishment in the afterlife (614b).  The souls of the dead go up through an opening on the right if they were just, or below through an opening on the left if they were unjust (614d).  The various souls discuss their rewards and punishments (614e-615a).  Socrates explains the multiples by which people are punished and rewarded (615a-b).  The souls of the dead are able to choose their next lives (617d) and then they are reincarnated (620e).  Socrates ends the discussion by prompting Glaucon and the others to do well both in this life and in the afterlife (621c-d).

2. Ethics or Political Philosophy?

The Republic has acquired the recognition of a classic and seminal work in political philosophy.  It is often taught in courses that focus on political theory or political philosophy.  Moreover, in the dialogue Socrates seems primarily concerned with what is an ethical issue, namely whether the just life is better than the unjust life for the individual.  These two observations raise two issues.  The first is whether the Republic is primarily about ethics or about politics.  If it is primarily about ethics then perhaps its recognition as a seminal political work is unwarranted.  Moreover, considering it a political work would be somewhat mistaken.  The second issue is that even if thinking of it as a classic in political philosophy is warranted, it is very difficult to situate it in terms of its political position.

Interpreters of the Republic have presented various arguments concerning the issue of whether the dialogue is primarily about ethics or about politics.  As is evident from Books I and II, Socrates’ main aim in the dialogue is to prove that the just person is better off than the unjust person.  In Book II, he proposes to construct the just city in speech in order to find justice in it and then to proceed to find justice in the individual (368a). Thus, he seems to use a discussion in political matters as a means by which to answer what is essentially an ethical question.  But, Socrates also spends a lot of time in the dialogue on political matters in relation to the question of political justice such as education, the positions and relations among political classes, war, property, the causes of political strife and change of regimes, and several other matters.  Each of these could provide important contributions to political philosophy.

One argument, suggesting that the dialogue is primarily concerned with the ethical question, focuses on Socrates’ presentation of the political discussion of justice as instrumental to discovering justice in the individual.  Another relevant consideration is that there are several indications in the dialogue that the aim in the discussion is more pressing than the means (the just city).  Thus, the argument goes, Socrates does not seem primarily interested in discussing political philosophy but ethics instead. Another related argument indicates that the discussion entails great doubts about whether the just city is even possible. Socrates claims this along with the idea that the function of the just city in the argument is to enable the individual to get a better idea of justice and injustice (472b-d, 592a-b).  Thus, it is very difficult for us to conclude that Socrates takes the political discussion as seriously as he does the moral question (see Annas, Julia.  Platonic Ethics, Old and New).

Other interpreters indicate that the Republic is essentially about both ethics and politics (among others see Santas, Gerasimos. Understanding Plato’s Republic; Schofield, Malcolm. Plato: Political Philosophy; Reeve C.D.C. Philosopher Kings). Some emphasize that many of Socrates’ proposals for social reform (education, property, the role of women, the family) go beyond what is needed to be able to argue that the just person is better off than the unjust person.  Thus, these social reforms seem to be developed for their own sake.

Some indicate that Socrates’ discussion of political matters is meant, in part, to provide us with Plato’s critique of Greek political life.  In Book VIII he criticizes democracy as an unjust regime and thus he seems to launch a critique against Athenian democracy.  He also adopts several measures in the just city, which were part of the Spartan constitution.  Like Spartan citizens, the guardians of the just city are professional soldiers whose aim is the protection of the city, the guardians eat together, and they have their needs provided for by other classes.  But unlike Sparta, the just city has philosophers as rulers, a rigorous system of education in intellectual matters, and it is not timocratic or honor loving.  These differences may be construed as a critique of Sparta’s political life.  Thus, the argument suggests, in addition to the main ethical question the dialogue is also about political philosophy.

Another position is that even though the discussion of political matters is instrumental to addressing the main ethical question of the dialogue, Socrates makes several important contributions to political philosophy.  One such contribution is his description of political regimes in Book VIII and his classification of them on a scale of more or less just.  Another such contribution is his consideration of the causes of political change from one political regime to another.  Moreover, Socrates seems to raise and address a number of questions that seem necessary in order to understand political life clearly.  He raises the issues of the role of women in the city, the role of the family, the role of art, the issue of class relations, of political stability, of the limitation of people’s freedoms and several others.  Thus, according to this view, it is warranted to regard the Republic as a work on political philosophy and as a seminal work in that area.

A further relevant consideration has to do with how one understands the nature of ethics and political philosophy and their relation.  Since modernity, it becomes much easier to treat these as separate subjects.  Modern ethics is more focused on determining whether an action is morally permissible or not whereas ancient ethics is more focused on happiness or the good life.  Many ancient thinkers want to address the question “what is the happy life?” and in order to do this they think that it is warranted to address political matters.  Humans live their lives in political communities and the kind of political community they live in can be conducive or detrimental to one’s happiness.  Thus, ethics and political philosophy are more closely linked for ancient thinkers than they may be for us since modernity.  Ethics and political philosophy seem to be different sides of the same coin.

The second issue has to do with situating the Republic’s political stance.  There are several competing candidates.  The Republic entails elements of socialism as when Socrates expresses the desire to achieve happiness for the whole city not for any particular group of it (420b) and when he argues against inequalities in wealth (421d).  There are also elements of fascism or totalitarianism. Among others, there is extreme censorship of poetry, lying to maintain good behavior and political stability, restriction of power to a small elite group, eugenic techniques, centralized control of the citizen’s lives, a strong military group that enforces the laws, and suppression of freedom of expression and choice.  Several commentators focused on these elements to dismiss the Republic as a proto-totalitarian text (see Popper, Karl.  The Open Society and Its Enemies). There are also some strong elements of communism such as the idea that the guardian class ought to possess things in common.  Despite, Socrates’ emphasis on the individual and the condition of his soul, the Republic does not entail the kernels of what becomes modern liberalism. Socrates seems to argue against allowing much freedom to individuals and to criticize the democratic tendency to treat humans as equals. Some have argued that the Republic is neither a precursor of these political positions nor does it fit any of them.  They find that the Republic has been such a seminal work in the history of political philosophy precisely because it raises such issues as its political stance while discussing many of the features of such political positions.

3. The Analogy of the City and the Soul

The analogy of the city and the soul, is Socrates proposed and accepted method by which to argue that the just person is better off than the unjust person (Book II, 368c-369a).  If Socrates is able to show how a just city is always happier than unjust cities, then he can have a model by which to argue that a just person is always happier than an unjust one.  He plausibly assumes that there is an interesting, intelligible, and non-accidental relation between the structural features and values of a city and an individual.  But commentators have found this curious approach one of the most puzzling features of the Republic.  The city/soul analogy is quite puzzling since Socrates seems to apply it in different ways, thus there is much controversy about the exact extent of the analogy.  Moreover, there is much controversy concerning its usefulness in the attempt to discover and to defend justice in terms of the individual.

In several passages Socrates seems to say that the same account of justice must apply to both cities (justice is the right order of classes) and to individuals (justice is the right order of the soul).  But even though he says this he seems to think that this ought to be the case for different reasons.  For example, at (435a), he seems to say that the same account of justice ought to apply to the city and to the individual since the same account of any predicate X must apply to all things that are X.  So, if a city or an individual is just then the same predicates must apply to both.  In other passages Socrates seems to mean that same account of justice ought to apply to the city and to the individual since the X-ness of the whole is due to the X-ness of the parts (435d).  So, if the people in the city are just, then this will cause the city to be just as well.  Yet still in other passages he seems to say that if a city is just and this causes it to have certain features such as wisdom or courage, then we can deduce that the individual’s being just will also cause him to be wise and courageous.  So if a city’s X-ness entails certain predicates, then the individual’s X-ness must entail the same predicates.  In other passages still, he seems to claim that the justice of the city can be used as a heuristic device by which to look for justice in the individual, thus the relation between the two seems quite loose (368e-369a).  (For a thorough discussion of these issues and the various interpretations of the city/soul analogy see Ferrari, G.R.F. City and Soul in Plato’s Republic.)

4. Plato’s Defense of Justice

In response to Thrasymachus, Glaucon, and Adeimantus, Socrates seeks to show that it is always in an individual’s interest to be just, rather than unjust.  Thus, one of the most pressing issues regarding the Republic is whether Socrates defends justice successfully or not.  David Sachs, in his influential article “A Fallacy in Plato’s Republic”, argues that Socrates’ defense of justice entails a crucial problem which renders the defense problematic.  Sachs argues that Socrates commits the fallacy of irrelevance.  Socrates sets out to defend the idea that it is always in one’s interest to be just and to act justly and he presents the just person as one who has a balanced soul.  Sachs observes that what Socrates defends is psychic health or rationality which may lead one to be happy but he fails to defend justice.  Socrates fails to show why having a balanced soul will lead one to act justly or why psychic health amounts to justice.  Sachs implies that justice, as this is traditionally understood, includes actions in relation to others, it includes considerations of other people’s good, and also includes strong motivations not to act unjustly.  According to Sachs, Socrates’ defense of justice does not include compelling reasons to think that a person with a balanced soul will refrain from acts that are traditionally thought to be unjust such as say, theft, murder, or adultery.  Thus, Plato presents Socrates defending psychic health rather than justice.

Sachs’ critique indicates that as Socrates presents the just person, the person’s balanced soul does not entail a sufficient causal or logical connection to performing socially just actions.  In order to save Socrates’ defense of justice one needs to show that there is a logical and a causal connection between having a balanced soul and performing socially just actions.  Otherwise, the problem of being psychically just but socially unjust remains

Given Sachs’ critique, several commentators have come to Socrates’ defense to bridge the gap between a just soul and just actions (these are discussed in detail by Singpurwalla, Rachel G. K. “Plato’s Defense of Justice in the Republic”).  One approach to bridging the gap between a just soul and just actions has been to show that the just person with a balanced soul operates according to certain values and desires which cannot lead to unjust actions (see Kraut, Richard “The Defense of Justice in Plato’s Republic”).  The just person’s soul entails desires for certain kinds of objects the most important of which is knowledge.  Socrates indicates the difficulty and extreme effort required to attain knowledge of the forms and the form of the Good, thus the just person will pursue learning and not spend time indulging in the satisfaction of desires that typically lead to unjust actions.  This approach of bridging the gap between a just soul and just actions may have some drawbacks.  One drawback may be that several unjust actions may be motivated by desires that are compatible with the desire for knowledge.  For example, why wouldn’t a person with a great desire for knowledge steal a book if this would contribute to his knowledge.

A second approach to bridging the gap between the just soul and just actions has been to show that the just person’s knowledge of the good, directly motivates him to perform just actions and to refrain from unjust ones (see Cooper, John “The Psychology of Justice in Plato’s Republic” and White, N. A Companion to Plato’s Republic).  A crucial piece of evidence for this approach is Socrates’ presentation of the philosopher who agrees to rule the city even though this will interfere with his desire to learn.  The proponents of this approach argue that the philosopher agrees to rule since his knowledge of the good directly motivates him to act against his interests and to do something that is good objectively and for others.  This approach has met at least one serious objection: the just person’s knowledge of the good may motivate him to do what is good for others but Socrates seeks to also argue that it is always in one’s interest to be just, thus this approach may suggest that just actions may not always be in the just person’s interests (for a discussion of this see Singpurwalla).  This objection amounts to the claim that the second approach may show that the just person will do just actions but it does this by sacrificing Socrates’ claim that being just is always in one’s interest.

Given the problems of the first two approaches, a third one attempts to show that the just person will do what is just in relation to others while at the same time doing what is in the just person’s interests.  In other words, this approach seeks to show that the just person’s own good is realized in doing what is also good for others.  According to this approach, the just person has a value that motivates him to do what is just, in relation to others and this value is the just person’s love of the forms (see Dahl, Norman “Plato’s Defense of Justice”).  The just person’s love of the forms is the desire to contemplate and also imitate or instantiate these in the world.  Thus, the philosopher regards ruling as something in his interest despite the fact that it interferes with his pursuit of knowledge, since in ruling he will be imitating the forms.  Even though this approach seems to bridge the gap between the just person and just actions and the gap between just actions and such actions being in the just person’s interest (this was the problem with the second approach) a criticism remains. Singpurwalla points out that only very few people can acquire such knowledge of the forms so as to be just persons, thus for most people Socrates offers no good reason to be just.  This third approach may save Socrates’ defense of justice only for people capable of knowing the forms, but falls short of showing that everyone has a reason to be just.

Singpurwalla suggests a fourth approach which can defend Socrates contra Sachs and which will avoid the criticisms launched against the other approaches.  She aims to show that Socrates has a good reason to think that it is in everyone’s interest to act justly because doing so satisfies a deeply ingrained human need, namely, the need to be unified with others.  Singpurwalla attempts to make her case by showing the following: (1) that according to Socrates our happiness largely resides in being unified with others (she cites the tyrant’s unhappiness due to bad relations with others as evidence for this, 567a-580a); (2) that being unified with others entails considering their own good when we act (she cites Socrates’ claims that when people are unified they share in each other’s pleasures and successes and failures as evidence for this, 462b-e, 463e-464d); (3) thus, behaving unjustly, which involves disregarding another’s good, is incompatible with being unified with others and with our happiness.  Singpurwalla’s position tries to show that even though the average person may not be able to attain the knowledge of the form of the good, he can still be motivated to act justly since this is in his interest.  Thus, Socrates’ defense of justice may be compelling for the philosopher as well as the average person.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Standard Greek Text

  • Slings, S.R. (ed.), Platonis Rempublicam (Oxford: Oxford Classical Texts, 2003).

b. English Translations

  • Shorey, Paul. Plato. Republic (2 vols. Loeb, 137-1937). This translation includes an introduction and notes.
  • Bloom, Allan. The Republic of Plato. (New York: Basic Books, 1968).  This translation includes notes and an interpretative essay.
  • Ferrari, G.R.F. (ed.), Griffith, Tom (trans.). Plato. The Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000).  This translation includes an introduction.
  • Reeve, C.D.C. Plato. The Republic. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 2004).

c. General Discussions of the Republic

(all attempt to provide a unified interpretation of the dialogue).

  • Murphy, N.R. The Interpretation of Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1951).
  • Cross, R.C. and Woozley, A.D. Plato’s Republic: A Philosophical Commentary (New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1964).
  • White, Nicholas P. A Companion to Plato’s Republic (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1979).
  • Annas, Julia. An Introduction to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1981).
  • Reeve, C.D.C. Philosopher Kings: The Argument of Plato’s Republic (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988).
  • Howland, Jacob. The Republic: The Odyssey of Philosophy (Philadelphia: Paul Dry Books, 2004).
  • Rosen, Stanley. Plato’s Republic: A Study (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2005).
  • Santas, Gerasimos. Understanding Plato’s Republic (Wiley-Blackwell, 2010).

d. Discussions on Plato’s Ethics and Political Philosophy

(all entail a systematic discussion of ethics and/or political philosophy in the Republic).

  • Irwin, T.H. Platos Ethics (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995).
  • Annas, Julia. Platonic Ethics Old and New (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999).
  • Monoson, Sara.  Plato’s Democratic Entanglements (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2000).
  • Bobonich, Christopher.  Plato’s Utopia Recast (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002).
  • Schofield, Malcolm. Plato: Political Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006).
  • Rowe, Christopher. “The Place of the Republic in Plato’s Political Thought” in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Canbridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).

e. Discussions on the City/Soul Analogy.

  • Williams, Bernard. “The Analogy of City and Soul in Plato’s Republic”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.).  Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
  • Lear, Jonathan. “Inside and Outside the Republic”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.).  Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
  • Ferrari, G.R.F. City and Soul in Plato’s Republic (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 2005).
  • Blossner, Norbert. “The City-Soul Analogy”, in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Canbridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).

f. Discussions of Plato’s Defense of Justice in the Republic

(in chronological order; these essays discuss how Socrates defends justice and examine how well he does in doing so).

  • Sachs, David. “A Fallacy in Plato’s Republic”, in The Philosophical Review 72 (1963): 141-58.
  • Dahl, Norman O. “Plato’s Defense of Justice”, in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. Vol. 51, No. 4 (Dec. 1991).
  • Kraut, Richard. “The Defense of Justice in Plato’s Republic”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
  • Singpurwalla, Rachel G.K. “Plato’s Defense of Justice in the Republic”, in Santas, Gerasimos (ed.). The Blackwell Guide to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2006).

g. Discussions of Political Measures Introduced in the Just City

i. Discussions of the Role of Women in the Just City

  • Discussions of the Role of Women in the Just City
  • Vlastos, Gregory.  “Was Plato a Feminist?”, Times Literary Supplement, No. 4, 485, Mar. 17, 1989, 276, 288-89.
  • Saxonhouse, Arlene. “The philosopher and the Female in the Political Thought of Plato”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
  • Reeve. C.D.C. “The Naked Old Women in the Palaestra”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).

ii. Discussions of Poetry in the Just City

  • Urmson, James O. “Plato and the Poets”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
  • O’Connor, David K. “Rewriting the Poets in Plato’s Characters”, in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Canbridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).
  • Moss, Jessica.  “What is Imitative Poetry and Why is it Bad?”, in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Canbridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).

iii. Discussions on the Soul in the Republic

  • Lorenz, Hendrik. “The Analysis of the Soul in Plato’s Republic” in Santas, Gerasimos (ed.). The Blackwell Guide to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2006).
  • Ferrari, G.R.F., “The Three-Part Soul”, in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Cambridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).

iv. Discussions on Plato’s Moral Psychology in the Republic

  • Cooper, John M. “The Psychology of Justice in Plato” in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
  • Anagnostopoulos, Mariana.  “The Divided Soul and the Desire for Good in Plato’s Republic” in Santas, Gerasimos (ed.). The Blackwell Guide to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2006).


Author Information

Antonis Coumoundouros
Adrian College
U. S. A.