Maimonides (1138—1204)

MaimonidesMaimonides is a medieval Jewish philosopher with considerable influence on Jewish thought, and on philosophy in general. Maimonides also was an important codifier of Jewish law. His views and writings hold a prominent place in Jewish intellectual history.

His works swiftly caused considerable controversy, especially concerning the relations between reason and revelation. Indeed, scholarly debates continue on Maimonides’ commitments to philosophy and to Judaism as a revealed religion. However, there is no question that his philosophical works have had a profound impact extending beyond Jewish philosophy. For instance, Aquinas and Leibniz are among the non-Jewish philosophers influenced by Maimonides.

This discussion of his philosophy focuses on some key features and themes rather than aiming to be a comprehensive survey. In particular, attention is drawn to ways in which Maimonides’ philosophical and religious thought were intertwined, focusing on the role of reason and intellectual perfection. In addition, the article highlights some of the significant ways he departs from Aristotle, while also borrowing from him. Maimonides was influenced by Aristotelian and Neoplatonic thought, and both of them have a significant presence, modified by his own original contributions.

Table of Contents

  1. Some Context and Biography
  2. Judaism and Philosophy
  3. The Relation to Aristotle’s Philosophy
  4. Some Fundamental Metaphysical and Epistemological Issues
  5. Maimonides on the Limits of Knowledge
  6. Philosophical Anthropology, Prophecy, and Perfection
  7. Maimonides on Ethical and Intellectual Virtue
  8. Some Key Elements of Moral Epistemology and Moral Psychology
  9. Freedom of the Will, Repentance, and Covenant
  10. The Issue of Esotericism
  11. Conclusion
  12. References and Further Reading

1. Some Context and Biography

After the destruction of the Second Temple by the Romans in 70 C.E., the Talmud became vitally important to Jewish life, both ritually and intellectually. The continuity and coherence of Jewish national life, their life as a people, was largely grounded in the fact that Jewish law bound them together despite diaspora and lack of political self-rule. Talmud was studied intensively, its contents being elaborated and developed to meet the varied conditions of economic, social, and political life. Talmud constitutes the most central collection of interpretation, explication, and commentary on the commandments in Torah, traditionally held to be six hundred and thirteen in number. Knowledge of Talmud, study of it, commentary upon it, and following its guidance bound Jews together as a people in covenant with God.

In addition to being an expert on scripture and Talmud, Maimonides was an important judge and legal official in the Jewish community in Egypt.  He was a physician in the Muslim court in Egypt and had extensive correspondence with Jews far and wide, writing detailed responses to questions of Jewish law and scriptural interpretation. Those of his works that are categorized as ‘philosophy’ reflect interests he had in addition to his religious commitments.

The prospects of medieval Jewish communities often depended upon the disposition of the Christian or Islamic rulers of the areas in which Jews lived. As is the case for several other important medieval Jewish philosophers, the larger intellectual culture in which Maimonides lived and worked was Islamic rather than Christian.

Maimonides (Moses ben Maimon)was born in Cordoba, Spain, and within a few years his family felt the need to flee persecution. They led a wandering life for several years and then settled in North Africa. They had fled the Iberian Peninsula after an especially intolerant Islamic dynasty came to power. Maimonides visited the Holy Land briefly and was distressed at the condition of Jews living there. He then spent much of his adult life in Fostat, the Old City of Cairo, near modern-day Cairo.

Maimonides and others in his family depended to a large extent on his younger brother, a successful merchant. His brother was lost at sea during a journey across the Indian Ocean, and Maimonides wrote that the loss of his brother pained him profoundly, leading him into depression. No longer having the support of his brother’s commercial successes, Maimonides made his living as a physician. In the latter part of his life he was physician to a Grand Vizier who was ruling Egypt for the Sultan Saladin. Though he wrote enormously important works on Jewish law he did not believe that one should be paid for being a teacher of Torah and Talmud.

He also wrote works on medicine and diseases, on various sciences, and other subjects. He conducted extensive correspondence with Jewish communities far and wide on diverse matters, from details of religious observance to how to respond when confronted with a choice between death and conversion. (See, for example, his Epistle to Yemen in Halkin and Hartman.) His codification of Jewish law, Mishneh Torah, remains a much studied and important work in the lives of Orthodox Jewish communities to this day. He led an almost breathlessly busy life as physician, judge, codifier of Jewish law, philosopher, scientist, and teacher. The rigors of his responsibilities are described in a letter to Samuel ben Judah ibn Tibbon, the man who translated Guide of the Perplexed from its original Arabic into Hebrew. Maimonides became quite widely known and respected by Jews and Muslims alike. He died in 1204 and his death was felt as a considerable loss.

Maimonides remains an important philosopher and key figure in Jewish religious tradition, offering extensive guidance on matters of Jewish law and Jewish life. Though there is a longstanding debate within Judaism over whether the central role ascribed to reason by Maimonides is in tension with Judaism as a revelation-based religious tradition it is difficult to imagine Judaism without his influence. Also, as noted above, he was an important influence on non-Jewish philosophers, such as Aquinas, Leibniz, and also on Spinoza, who had his own controversial place in Jewish thought.

Maimonides had encyclopedic knowledge of Jewish law and one of his main projects was to try to organize the massive, complex body of interpretation, argument, and elaboration in a systematic, orderly manner. By doing this, he intended to obviate the need for further codification and interpretation. He sought to provide a normatively authoritative presentation of Jewish law. His aim was to articulate what he took to be the correct interpretation of the law without also including the argumentation that yielded his interpretation. The aim was to make the law accessible, to make it easier to find and follow what the law required. The work that resulted, the Mishneh Torah, was a formidable achievement. While it did not bring interpretation and codification of Jewish law to closure, it has remained throughout the centuries a vitally important guide to Jewish law for large numbers of Orthodox Jews. In that respect, it has more than just historical importance.

Maimonides’ most famous philosophical work, Guide of the Perplexed, was written to a former student as a series of letters. The student, a young man named Joseph, had written to ask how to reconcile his commitment to Judaism and Jewish tradition on the one hand with his commitment to reason and demonstrative science on the other. Joseph was himself a very capable and learned individual, and the Guide is the subtle, complex, layered series of letters written by Maimonides in reply.

2. Judaism and Philosophy


During the period when Maimonides lived, a small number of Islamic thinkers were attached to sultanates in something like a position of ‘court philosopher,’ to build libraries, increase knowledge, and preserve the ancient inheritance. In the Christian world there were cathedral schools and, by the twelfth and thirteenth centuries, a number of universities. In contrast, Jews were scattered and the Temple in Jerusalem, formerly the locus of priestly ritual, had been destroyed centuries earlier. Following that destruction and the huge wave of killing by the Romans, Judaism survived in large measure through the development of the rabbinic tradition, to which Talmud was crucial. This is relevant to Maimonides as a philosopher because so much of his work was the project of articulating what he took to be the philosophical wisdom in Scripture and Jewish law. There is a powerful rationalistic disposition in Maimonides’ thought, and this included the way he understood religious texts.

In the tenth century Saadia Gaon set much of the agenda of medieval Jewish philosophy in The Book of Beliefs and Opinions. A ‘gaon’ is a head of one of the great Talmudic academies; Saadia was head of the academy in Sura, in present-day Iraq. Saadia’s thought was not clearly Neoplatonic, nor was it clearly Aristotelian. Nonetheless, he was a sophisticated thinker, and one of the main themes of his great work is that Judaism is vindicated by reason. The Book of Beliefs and Opinions opens with an extensive discussion of epistemological issues in which Saadia was anxious to show how Judaism is a religion of reason. He argued that, while revelation is real, much of the substance of what is revealed can be understood in rational terms and is not ultimately a matter of mystery. Saadia was influenced by kalam, (Islamic dialectical theology, and Maimonides criticized him for it. Maimonides regarded kalam as less rationally rigorous than philosophy. Nevertheless, Saadia’s work is important as background and intellectual context. Maimonides saw himself as improving upon the theses Saadia defended and the arguments Saadia developed. In addition, the intellectual context included some important Neoplatonic Jewish thinkers, such as Isaac Israeli and Solomon ibn Gabirol, and some sharp critics of rationalism, such as Judah Halevi.

For a thinker like Maimonides it is very difficult, and in some ways artificial, to separate his philosophical thought from his religious thought. An unhelpful way of looking at this is to believe his religious commitments unduly bias his philosophy or make his philosophical conclusions only valuable to those who share his religious beliefs. It is better to recognize that the sorts of intellectual motivations and presuppositions that influence a thinker’s philosophy can illuminate its claims and commitments. Moreover, many medieval philosophers were very rigorous thinkers, bold in argumentation and in critiquing predecessors, and they departed from predecessors in important ways. Many exhibited a high level of analytical acuity. That is certainly true of Maimonides.

Maimonides did not write purely philosophical works. His works that are regarded as philosophical address issues motivated by religious ideas and concerns. However, Maimonides held that reason and revelation concern one body of truth; each is a mode of access to truth, and he thought there was significant philosophical wisdom in revelation. This is a theme that will run through the rest of this discussion.

Maimonides’ negative theology, his intellectualist conception of human virtue, and his conception of the epistemological role of tradition—to pick just a few examples—are philosophically significant despite the very numerous differences between his time and ours.

As noted above, Maimonides’s great philosophical work, Guide of the Perplexed, was written to a young man who was both a committed Jew and strongly interested in philosophy and the authority of rational understanding. He wrote to Maimonides for guidance on how to reconcile, or not, those two commitments. It is a very challenging work. Maimonides himself notes that it contains obscurities and contradictions, in large part on account of the need to reach different audiences with different levels of philosophical understanding. There is a scholarly debate about whether Maimonides was ultimately ‘loyal’ to philosophy or to Judaism.The debate concerns the degree to which Maimonides’ thought involves an esoteric message threatening to religious orthodoxy but likely not to be grasped by non-philosophers.

The present discussion does not examine that debate directly. Instead, it focuses on what appear to be the chief philosophical conceptions shaping his thought. To be sure, even if the debate about esotericism is not taken up explicitly, the views presented are relevant at least by implication; complete neutrality on the issue is not possible. Still, the main aim here is to survey the content and character of key elements of Maimonides’ philosophy without also examining and evaluating recent scholarly debates about it.

3. The Relation to Aristotle’s Philosophy


There are many respects in which Maimonides’ philosophy borrows from Aristotle. Maimonides noted that he esteemed Aristotle’s philosophical achievement as the pinnacle of unaided reason. In addition, Islamic philosophers, much of whose thought owed a great deal to Aristotle, influenced Maimonides (see Ibn Rush (Averroes), Avicenna (Ibn Sin)). Their Aristotelianism often involved elements of Platonism, interwoven in often complex ways. Still, it is clear that from metaphysics to logic to philosophical anthropology to ethics, Maimonides used many of Aristotle’s concepts and philosophical categories. However, he often used them in un-Aristotelian ways, ways shaped by Maimonides’ guiding concerns, which were not always shared by Aristotle. For instance, freedom of the will was vitally important to Maimonides because of its significance in regard to following, or not following, the commandments. Maimonides’ conception of the virtues differed from Aristotle’s in many respects on account of Maimonides’ concern with holiness.

Maimonides’ views on creation, revelation, and redemption depart from Aristotle’s views, even though they are joined to Aristotelian conceptions and insights. Tracing out the implications of creation, revelation, and redemption is a way of understanding many of the differences between Maimonides and the ancient inheritance. To a large extent, that inheritance had been modified by commentators on the ancients and by successors to the ancients. As such, the Aristotelianism Maimonides encountered had already been modified to some degree by Arabic commentators. Some of the commentators, Al-Farabi for example, made little distinction between Plato and Aristotle. Much of the philosophy in the few centuries before Maimonides was what we might call ‘Neoplatonic Aristotelianism.’ In Maimonides’ works there are quite evident Platonic, as well as Aristotelian, influences.

Maimonides argued that Torah contained philosophical wisdom and that the most complete understanding of Torah is philosophical understanding.Thus, creation, revelation, and redemption are at the very core of Maimonides’ understanding of all of reality. In The Guide of the Perplexed Maimonides argues that the eternity of the world is not demonstrable. He undertook a detailed analysis of the reasoning in favor of the world’s eternity and concluded that it could be neither proved nor disproved. In that situation, we are to rely on what is made known to us by revelation but not by a simple, dogmatic assertion of faith. Rather, close study of Torah on the basis of epistemically and explanatorily sound principles leads us to belief in a First Cause as creator, which providentially governs the world with concern for the beings created in its image, that is, rational beings. Thus, the relationship between human beings and the First Cause is understood in a significantly different way than in Aristotle’s philosophy.

One of the chief differences is that the world is the result of a free act of creation, rather than a necessary emanation, as in many Neoplatonic conceptions, involving no volitional element. Emanation appears to have a role in Maimonides’ conception of the world order, though he emphasizes the significance of creation ex nihilo by God as bringing the world order into existence. That there is a world is not to be explained by it processing by necessity, from the First Cause. Thus, the very existence of things is seen as reflecting God’s graciousness rather than metaphysical necessitation. The relations between the several intellects ordering the different spheres that constitute the world are sometimes described by Maimonides as being related by a process of overflow, each emanating from the one immediately superior to it. The relations between causality, agency, emanation, and overflow are complex and perplexing. It is very difficult to sort them out definitively in Maimonides’ thought. Nonetheless, he does appear to have held that God is First Cause, God freely created the world, and God sustains the world in existence.

Aristotle understood the existence of the world as necessary, given the essence of the First Cause. According to him, God does not make the world and does not will a created order into existence. The causality of the First Cause is not exercised by, for instance, creating the world ex nihilo or even creating it out of a formless pre-existing material substratum. Aristotle, in contrast to some Neoplatonic Aristotelians, did not regard the world as emanating from the First Cause. He also did not regard the world as existing contingently, based on volition of the First Cause.

For Maimonides creation is so important because the First Cause is understood to have brought the world into existence through benevolence and wisdom, reflected in the created order. Through study of the created order we can enlarge our understanding of God. Revelation is so important because it means that human beings receive help through divine graciousness. Through the giving of Torah human beings are provided with direction to perfection. This includes guidance regarding repentance and how to return to God when one sins. Redemption—understood here as the culmination of providence—is important because it means that the created order is under divine governance. That means that there is what we might call ‘ultimate’ or ‘cosmic’ justice. Human beings may not fully understand the wisdom and goodness of the created order, consider Job for example, but they can be confident that it is indeed governed by divine reason and justice.

4. Some Fundamental Metaphysical and Epistemological Issues

Because creation has implications for a great many issues in Maimonides’ philosophy, it is suitable as a starting point for discussing some main elements of Maimonides’ metaphysical views.

Maimonides examined what he took to be the three main approaches to accounting for the world. They are (i) a free act of creation ex nihilo, (ii) imposition of form on pre-existing matter, (iii) eternal emanation. In this last approach the world did not come into being ex nihilo or de novo. Maimonides did not claim to have demonstrative proof that God created the world ex nihilo and de novo. Neither did he claim that he could conclusively refute the second and third approaches. Among Jewish thinkers there were some who accepted a Platonist view that God imposed form on pre-existent matter. However, Maimonides held that we should accept the Biblical story of creation, suitably interpreted in philosophical terms. There is nothing inconsistent or incoherent in it, and we have the authority of the Bible with which to support it.

Maimonides held that God so far exceeds our capacity to have knowledge of the divine nature that we are severely limited in how we are able to describe or comprehend God. Even substance cannot be predicated of God in the sense with which we use the word to express knowledge of entities in the created order. In the terms of Maimonides’ negative theology, we would not describe God as the most powerful, all-knowing, incorruptible substance at the top of a hierarchy of substances. That is a positive conception. However, we can say things about God on the basis of what we can know about the effects of divine activity, not the activity itself. “Every attribute that is found in the books of the deity…is therefore an attribute of His action and not an attribute of His essence”(Guide of the Perplexed, I, 53, p. 121).

We can say that God is gracious or that God is powerful or merciful as long as we remain mindful that these phrases describe attributes of the world and do not directly refer to God.  Thus, we can speak of features of God’s actions but not God’s attributes. To speak of attributes would be to speak of properties of God, something God’s transcendence makes impossible. Still, we are not limited to utter silence regarding God. There is much we can say about the created order and about the effects of God’s causal activity though we cannot understand divine activity in its own right. God’s unity, the simplicity of the divine nature, is not a unity of parts, properties, or powers. It is beyond our capacity of positive comprehension though we see the benevolence and wisdom of the created order. Our use of language in speaking of God is equivocal in relation to its use in speaking of other things. That is, it is neither univocal with its use in other contexts, nor is it analogical to use in other contexts. (There is a helpful discussion of approaches to religious language in the article on that topic in this encyclopedia.)

Maimonides’ denial that in talk of God terms are used with meanings that are univocal with or analogous to their use in other contexts may seem to undermine our ability to use language to say anything at all when speaking of God. It may seem to cut us off from any grounding of semantic meaning in that context. Still, Maimonides held that negative theology was needed in order not to misrepresent divine simplicity and that speaking of what God causes is a meaningful way to speak of God.

Maimonides argued that our comprehension of God is limited to negations, for example negations of finitude, ignorance, plurality, corporeal existence, and so forth. Our use of terms such as ‘knowledge,’ ‘justice,’ ‘benevolence,’ and ‘will’ in speaking of God is equivocal. Such terms do not have the same meaning when predicated of human beings as they do when applied to God.

In the Guide, in regard to the application of predicates to God, Maimonides wrote:

[B]etween our knowledge and His knowledge there is nothing in common, as there is nothing in common between our essence and His essence. With regard to this point, only the equivocality of the term “knowledge” occasions the error; for there is a community only in the terms, whereas in the true reality of the things there is a difference. It is from this that incongruities follow necessarily, as we imagine that things that obligatorily pertain to our knowledge pertain also to His knowledge (Guide, III, 20, p. 482).

It is not simply that we lack the concepts with which to represent God’s power, knowledge, benevolence, and so forth; it is that God so completely transcends every created entity and conception available to human reason that in attempting to describe God we are silenced. We know that God exists, is a unity, and is eternal. We know this via revelation. Anything else to be said of God can only be said by describing the effects of God’s activity.

Maimonides wrote, “It has also become clear in metaphysics that by our intellects we are unable to attain perfect comprehension of His existence, may He be exalted. This is due to the perfection of His existence and the deficiency of our intellects. His existence has no causes by which He could be known” (Maimonides, “Eight Chapters,” in Ethical Writings of Maimonides, Ch. VIII, pp. 94-5). Thus, in Maimonides’ view, “It therefore follows that we do not know His knowledge either, nor do we comprehend it in any way, since He is His knowledge and His knowledge is He” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 95).

It would be a serious error to think that God’s knowledge is the same kind of knowledge as human knowledge only more complete. It would also be erroneous to think that God’s volitional power is the same type of power as human volition, only without the limitations to which humans are subject. Maimonides’ negative theology was a strategy for preserving the utter and complete uniqueness of God while also not being rendered utterly silent and inarticulate in regard to God and divine attributes. Through the created order we understand that God is wise, benevolent, all-powerful, eternal, one, and unchanging. However, we must be careful in how we use language about God because the unity of God’s nature implies that predicating multiple attributes of God is already an error unless it is understood through negative theology.

Maimonides’ approach had to come to grips with Scripture’s extensive use of descriptive terms in speaking of God. We are told that God is forgiving and merciful, long-suffering and patient, that God is generous and loving, that God becomes angry, and that God is jealous and insists on being the unique object of worship. For a great many people the understanding of God, the commandments, and human beings’ relationship to God depends heavily on the use of descriptively rich language. Like some other medieval philosophers, Maimonides held that the same truths could be represented and conveyed by different means, in accord with different levels of sophistication of understanding. For those not capable of philosophical understanding metaphysical principles and demonstrative proofs would be inscrutable and uninformative. They needed to hear truths about God in an idiom accessible to them. The same truths could be articulated and explicated in terms of philosophical understanding.

The anthropomorphic language of Scripture is suited to convey important truths to ‘ordinary,’ non-philosophical understanding. Philosophical understanding can interpret the idiom of Scripture in a way that ascertains its metaphysical meaning. Maimonides concurred with many Jewish thinkers in holding that “[t]he Torah speaks in accordance with the language of the children of Man.” That language is sufficiently rich to speak to the ‘plain person’ and the philosopher.

The sort of negation intended by Maimonides’ negative theology reflects the fact that language cannot capture and express God’s nature. Kenneth Seeskin illustrates this:

If I say that this horse does not lack the ability to run, you would be justified in concluding that its running ability is unimpaired….this cannot be what Maimonides says about God because even if God is superlatively powerful, we would still be assigning God to the class of powerful things. Instead what Maimonides means is that God is not in the class of things that are either powerful or weak in the normal sense of the term. God does not lack power, but neither is God’s power comparable with other things (Kenneth Seeskin, p. 89).

As Seeskin puts the point, “God falls under no description” (Seeskin, p.88). How then are we to imitate God by being righteous, showing loving kindness, and exercising judgment? As noted above, Maimonides’ solution is that we can comprehend and describe features of the created order, features of what God has brought about or what God has done. What we predicate of the world is not also to be predicated of God. Rather, we find that the created order reflects graciousness and benevolence, which is something distinct from God, who is the cause of it.

However, it was crucial to show that the language of the Torah did not mean literally that God is corporeal. Indeed, that would be the profoundest error of all. Nor did the fact that the Israelites were commanded to perform sacrifices mean that idolatry was acceptable. Such matters reflect the fact that truths need to be expressed in ways that are accessible to ordinary persons. Moreover, with time and the discipline of practice, it is possible for understanding to be deepened and enlarged. Sacrifice is, as it were, a stage on the way to a religion of prayer, which is a stage on the road to a religion of understanding. The commandments, in their complex wisdom regarding human nature, guide in the direction of increasingly rational religion. Maimonides maintained that there is no distinct religious understanding or faculty of religious knowledge. All cognition is intellectual cognition. That is true of prophecy as well as metaphysics. Moreover, Maimonides interpreted religious practice in a way that highlights God’s wisdom concerning what is needed to help human beings do and understand the things that will perfect them.

An important element of Maimonides’ view is that philosophical wisdom and fundamental truths about reality contained in Scripture and Jewish tradition  were known to a much earlier age but have since been lost and need to be retrieved. He held that those parts of Scripture concerning “the account of the beginning” contain fundamental truths about the natural world, or physics, and those concerning “the account of the chariot” in Ezekiel contain fundamental truths of metaphysics. One must master a very difficult process of learning to ascertain those truths. For example, Scripture contains a great deal of anthropomorphism, but Abraham and the patriarchs, Maimonides argued, understood that the existence of an eternal, incorporeal God could be demonstrated.

While we cannot have a positive conception of God’s nature, we can know that metaphysically a First Cause must exist, and through study of the created order, we can have knowledge of the effect of divine activity. Maimonides’ negative theology is a barrier to ascribing anthropomorphisms to God but it is not a barrier to knowledge of God’s existence or knowledge of features of the world God made. This is a strongly philosophical conception of religion. According to it, fulfilling the commandments is the way to develop one’s capacities and dispositions so that it is possible to come to understand the philosophical truths of the Hebrew Bible.

Maimonides’ insistence on the integral place of philosophy in Judaism was highly objectionable to many traditionalists though Maimonides understood his own work as explicating the truths of tradition rather than rejecting tradition or suggesting that it is anachronistic. He did not seek to replace tradition with philosophy but to articulate the rationality of tradition and show the ways in which philosophical depth and truth are present in Jewish thought and tradition. His thought resonated with Platonic and Aristotelian ideas in the respect that he regarded human beings as having a rational nature, most completely realized in intellectual perfection. The intellect in act is the actualization proper to a human being. Scripture and tradition are guides to attaining that actualization. They do not concern some other sort of truth or end.

5. Maimonides on the Limits of Knowledge

Maimonides’ negative theology is complemented by other elements of his epistemology. For example, he held that there are significant limitations on what human beings can demonstrate scientifically. We cannot, he thought, have demonstrative knowledge of astronomy though we can have demonstrable knowledge of sublunar physics. Recall that many ancient and medieval thinkers held that there is a real difference between the sublunar and supralunar realms. It was thought that the two realms are intelligible through different principles because the natures of the entities in them are different. Aristotle had held that, though the two realms are different, it is possible to have demonstrative knowledge of each of them.

Maimonides rejected this on the basis of empirical considerations, but the rejection had more than empirical implications. He argued that the motions of several celestial bodies were not in accord with what Aristotelian science held in regard to the motions of the spheres. If indeed there are exceptions to what should be necessities of physics, this shows that there are ‘particularities’ among heavenly phenomena, and that is evidence in favor of God as a creator who has made the heavens such as to show the particularities of the created order. In this way, what may look like an argument within physics is connected in a significant way with the dispute concerning whether the world is eternal and necessary or is the work of a creating God.

Maimonides accepted a great deal of Aristotle’s science, both in regard to its overall epistemology and in regard to many of its specific explanations. In Part II of the Guide Maimonides presented twenty-five postulates of Aristotelian physics, and he went on to argue for their indisputable role in scientific explanation. However, there were respects in which astronomy seemed problematic with regard to Aristotelian physics. The complex systems of motion developed to account for astronomical phenomena and the arrangement of celestial bodies could be shown to make mathematical sense but did not fully cohere with some substantive commitments of Aristotelian-Ptolemaic science. Chief among these is that mathematical astronomy did not consistently show that the earth is the fixed center of the celestial order. Maimonides thus distinguished between mathematical astronomy—which exhibited a systematic, if quite complex, order including eccentric spheres and epicycles—and physical reality, with particular features that cannot be demonstrated.

Overall, a number of scientific issues supplied a basis for Maimonides to claim that neither eternity nor creation is demonstrable. However, we are not forced into a suspension of judgment regarding the matter. As indicated above, there is another source of knowledge, namely, authentic tradition. This would seem very ad hoc and quite unconvincing if Maimonides did not develop a sophisticated conception of tradition as a source of knowledge. Earlier Jewish thinkers made important contributions to this issue. Saadia Gaon’s The Book of Belief and Opinions is especially important in this regard. What is striking about Maimonides’ approach is the manner in which it is related to other elements of his philosophy such as his negative theology.

Negative theology is a basis for an interpretation of Scripture, especially its anthropomorphisms, and is consistent with Maimonides’ conception of demonstrative science, prophecy understood in cognitive terms, and his intellectualist conception of human perfection. The negative theology enabled him to explain Scripture without being confined to literalism. Understanding of the text needs to cohere strongly with scientific and metaphysical—rational—understanding. That is what Maimonides tries to show. The oneness and incorporeality of God are truths of reason, and a sound interpretation of Scripture must preserve those truths. When Genesis (1:26) says that man is created in the likeness of God that does not mean that God has a body. Again, this is not to say that we have a complete comprehension of God, but metaphysical reasoning eliminates the hypothesis that God is a material being. Thus, what Genesis says should be interpreted to mean that man has a rational, indeed intellectual, form. This is a good illustration of how Maimonides interpreted Scripture as containing philosophical content in ways that may not be explicit but can be recognized and elaborated by human reason.

6. Philosophical Anthropology, Prophecy, and Perfection

The notion of the world as a created order and an order reflecting, in sometimes very complex, unobvious ways, divine goodness and wisdom is crucial for Maimonides. It is the foundation for the account of human nature, the human predicament, and the help that God gives to human beings. We can gain some additional insight into this by considering Maimonides’ interpretation of the Garden and of Adam and Eve eating of the tree of knowledge of good and evil after having been warned against doing so.

It is essential to Maimonides’ philosophical anthropology that human beings have an intellectual essence, a rational nature capable of comprehending intelligible features of reality. Again, to say that man is created in God’s image is to say that a human being has a rational soul. In Maimonides’ view Adam and Eve could have led untroubled lives guided exclusively by clear intellectual conceptions of the true and the false, without concern with good and evil. Such lives would have been free of frustration, pain, anxiety, and fear. All that was required was that Adam and Eve heed the injunction not to eat of the tree of the knowledge of good and evil. In eating of the tree they yielded to distraction from intellectual activity and sought satisfaction in the lesser objects of the imagination. Good and evil are not, in Maimonides’ view, demonstrable or intuited intelligibles. Our conceptions of good and evil involve the imagination.

In his treatment of Adam and Eve Maimonides is presenting key elements of his anthropology rather than exploring details of a particular episode of human history. His primary concern is to explicate basic features of human nature and the human condition and to make fundamental points about human intellectual capacities and the aspects of human nature as the basis of an ethical life. In the Guide Maimonides writes of Adam:

For the intellect that God made overflow unto man and that is the latter’s ultimate perfection, was that which Adam had been provided with before he disobeyed. It was because of this that it was said of him that that he was created in the image of God and in His likeness. It was likewise on account of it that he was addressed by God and given commandments, as it says: And the Lord God commanded, and so on (Guide, I, 2, p. 24).

In addition

Now man in virtue of his intellect knows truth from falsehood; and this holds good for all intelligible things. Accordingly when man was in his most perfect and excellent state, in accordance with his inborn disposition and possessed of his intellectual cognitions—because of which it is said of him: Thou has made him but little lower than Elohim—he had no faculty that was engaged in any way in the consideration of generally accepted things, and he did not apprehend them(Guide, I, 2, p. 25).

In failing to heed the warning not to eat of the tree of knowledge of good and evil, Adam “disobeyed the commandment that was imposed upon him on account of his intellect and, becoming endowed with the faculty of apprehending generally accepted things, he became absorbed in judging things to be bad or fine” (Guide, I, 2, p. 25). It is notable that the view that imagination can be a source of error and can lead us away from clear understanding has ancient roots. The ancient and medieval conceptions of how imagination compares unfavorably with intellect contrast sharply with many modern conceptions of the role and importance of imagination.

Adam’s and Eve’s error persists as a feature of our nature. Human beings are susceptible to distraction from the truth and from contemplation of the intelligible. We concern ourselves with other things and often with an urgency of desire. Maimonides did not interpret the story of Adam and Eve in the Garden in the way it is understood through the Christian notion of ‘The Fall’ or ‘Original Sin.’ According to Christianity only the supernatural agency of Christ, making a human reborn through the grace of Christ’s Passion, can restore the integrity of human nature. Judaism does not include such a conception. Maimonides held that God’s grace is exhibited through the giving of Torah, which is a guide to a virtuous and holy life, and by fulfilling the commandments through both understanding and action, a person can return to God, become close to God. This is explicable in terms of ethical and intellectual virtue without an additional supernatural agency. Judaism does not share the Christian conception of a profoundly wounded human nature, incapable of repairing itself. There is, though, a role for grace in Judaism; the giving of Torah reflects divine graciousness.

To Maimonides Adam’s and Eve’s sin of indulgence indicates that human beings can be distracted from truth. Human beings are creatures with passions and desires,  not only intellect. One epistemological implication of this anthropology is that moral judgments are non-demonstrable. Morality reflects the fact that human beings are not purely intellectual beings, something highlighted in Maimonides’ interpretation of the Garden.

Maimonides had a complex view of the rationality of the commandments and the relation between ethical virtue and intellectual virtue. Before going directly into that topic, it is important to comment on some key features of Maimonides’ conception of prophecy. His account of prophecy has deep connections with his metaphysics and epistemology. Maimonides conceptualized revelation and prophecy in rationalistic terms. He explicated prophecy as an emanation, ultimately from God, transmitted to human beings via the causality of the Agent Intellect. In Maimonides’ view there is no role for mystery in prophecy. Like Saadia before him, he did not regard Judaism as involving any fundamentally mysterious doctrines. Prophecy is understood in terms of emanation of intelligible form to an individual especially apt to receive it on account of their strength of rational and imaginative faculties.

The prophet has an ability to receive a more than ordinary extent of intellectual emanation. He also has an imagination of sufficient power to represent concretely what has been intellectually received. The chief point is that prophecy belongs on the same epistemological spectrum as other types of rational knowledge, such as science and metaphysics. In fact, Maimonides was a severe critic of many types of mysticism and was especially harsh in his objections to astrology. In part, that was because he thought that the determinism associated with astrology was in conflict with the compelling case for freedom of the will, an issue discussed below. Knowledge—understood as comprehension of intelligible forms—requires a causal agency to actualize it in an individual with the potentiality to acquire knowledge. The Agent Intellect actualizes knowledge in human beings. This is true in general and prophecy is, in principle, no different.

With respect to the emanation of intelligible form Maimonides held that if a person is such that only the person’s rational faculty is affected, then that is a speculative person. If the rational and imaginative faculties are affected, then that person is a prophet. If only the imagination is affected, the individual is a lawgiver. Imagination is crucial because of how it makes it possible to give concrete representation to intelligible knowledge, a representation by which the prophetic message is accessible to the great majority of people.

This element of Maimonides’ view is similar in some important respects to Alfarabi’s view. The prince needs wisdom and persuasive skill so that the great majority of people—who can be led by persuasion and compulsion but not by demonstration of the relevant truths—can be effectively led in a way that is oriented to the good. In Alfarabi’s view the ruler needs multiple virtues including theoretical virtue, deliberative virtue, moral virtue, and practical art. The ‘elect’ have knowledge that is demonstrated; they have an intellectual grasp of principles, and they can see what follows from them by necessity. They have rational understanding. The vulgar are reached by persuasion, and they have a grasp of things through imaginative representation rather than demonstration.

Maimonides’ view is, in a broad sense, a naturalistic conception of prophecy. The connection between the prophet and the Agent Intellect is not made by an act of God; God can block prophecy but an individual meets the conditions for prophecy on epistemological terms, so to speak, not through divine intervention. In Maimonides’ view the prophet does not have a mysterious experience or an extraordinary faculty. Still, to be effective as a prophet, the person must also be able to apply their higher understanding effectively and that involves the kind of concrete detail that can only come from imagination.In discussing prophecy Maimonides presented three main positions on the issue. They are:

  1. God can make anyone a prophet. (This is the vulgar view.)
  2. Prophecy is a perfection involving the height of intellectual, imaginative capacities, and moral character. (This is the philosophical view.)
  3. Prophecy is as the philosophical view maintains, but God, through performance of a miracle, can prevent a suitably virtuous person from becoming a prophet. (This, Maimonides says, is the Jewish view.)

No one lacking virtue can be a prophet. Only a person with the relevant perfections will become a prophet; however, because the performance of divine miracles is possible, God can prevent even a person with the relevant perfections from becoming a prophet. Because Maimonides acknowledges the possibility of miracles, he allows that God can prevent prophecy. Overall, this is a naturalistic conception, though it is couched in language suitable to non-philosophical persons’ beliefs in the importance of miracles.

Also, it should be noted that there is one exception to the typology above. Maimonides held that in Moses’ case, prophecy was entirely intellectual. Moses was capable of a uniquely complete comprehension of intelligibles.

Maimonides’ philosophy shows the influence of Aristotle, Islamic commentaries on Aristotle, kalam, and Neoplatonism. Aristotelianism and Neoplatonism intersect in his view that the further away from the ground and source of being—the further from God in the created order—the less perfect are beings and the more susceptible they are to degeneration, change, and ceasing to be. The more fully a human being actualizes the intellect, the more like God that individual becomes inasmuch as actuated intellect has no tendency to corruption or change. A human being whose intellect is actualized as fully as possible is able to come closer to God. That striving involves the exercise of ethical virtue and intellectual virtue. This is an intellectualized conception of imitatio dei. The created order is a series of levels of reality, each more remote from and less like the ground and source of being, but human beings are capable of being close to God through understanding.

Maimonides says of man that “[h]is ultimate perfection is to become rational in actu, I mean to have an intellect in actu” (Guide, III, 27, p. 511). In addition, , “[i]t is clear that to this ultimate perfection there do not belong either actions or moral qualities and that it consists only of opinions toward which speculation has led and that investigation has rendered compulsory” (Guide, III, 27, p. 511).

The more one’s intellect is actualized, the more one is protected by providence in the metaphysical sense that one is less liable to corruption and ceasing to be. In short, Maimonides held that a person is immortal, capable of surviving bodily death, to the extent that one’s intellect is actualized. There are then, degrees of immortality and degrees of being protected by providence. Prophecy, providence, and immortality are all explicated along these Aristotelian/Neoplatonic lines.

Maimonides was criticized for not clearly and emphatically asserting that resurrection of the dead is a fundamental principle of Judaism. It was really not until the medieval era and the deadly pressures on Jews caught between Islam and Christianity during the Crusades that Jewish thinkers formulated a dogma for Judaism. The formulation of dogma could be helpful to Jews pressured to defend their religion and needing to have ready replies to theological attacks on it. Maimonides formulated Thirteen Fundamental Principles of Jewish Faith, the last of which is belief that the dead will be brought back to life when God wills it. Apart from a small number of passages in the Prophets, the resurrection of the dead does not figure in the Hebrew Bible. Nevertheless, by the thirteenth century it was becoming a more accepted, shared element of Judaism, and Maimonides included it among his Thirteen Principles. The doctrine is in tension with the intellectualistic Aristotelianism of Maimonides’ anthropology, and scholarly debate over whether he genuinely accepted the doctrine continues.

A significant respect in which his anthropology differs from Aristotle’s is connected with creation, revelation, and redemption. Aristotle’s Metaphysics opens with “All men by nature desire to know.” This is not an ordinary empirical claim; it states something Aristotle took to be fundamental to human nature, namely, that our telosis intellectual. A human being’s nature is most completely realized in intellectual activity, and multiple features of human nature are to be understood in terms of how they are related to that telos. Thus far, the agreement between Aristotle and Maimonides is quite close.

However, for Aristotle, a human being’s most fundamental orientation to the world is wonder. That reflects our telos, and it is motivationally important to the activities through which our telos can be realized. Maimonides would agree that wonder is a basic feature of our rational nature but, given the fact of creation and revelation and God’s justice and mercy, it can be said that a human being’s most basic orientation to reality is gratitude or a combination of gratitude and humility. This is because gratitude is owed to God for the very existence of the world and for the wisdom of the created order. Our highest end is a loving cognition of God. The fact that human beings have been given aid through revelation of Torah reshapes the Aristotelian conception of both human beings and the world overall. Creation, revelation, and redemption are not just ‘accessories’ to what is otherwise an unchanged Aristotelian philosophy. Gratitude includes an aspiration to holiness, a resolve to fulfill the commandments so that one imitates God, to the extent possible for a human being, through attaining understanding and acting in ways informed by understanding.

Humility has a place in a person’s fundamental orientation at least in the respect that perhaps the most compelling and evident conception a person can have is the conception of all things being dependent upon God. Even in striving for virtue and perfection of one’s nature through one’s own voluntary activity, humility is appropriate because of the contrast between human beings and God and because of the divine graciousness in giving help to human beings via revelation. We will see below, in the discussion of ethics, how Maimonides’ view of pride and humility is strikingly different from Aristotle’s.

Given the central role of the commandments in regard to human perfection, we are in position now to address some of the specific features of Maimonides’ conception of the relation between the ethical and the intellectual and how they are mutually reinforcing.

7. Maimonides on Ethical and Intellectual Virtue

As a pathway into Maimonides’ account of the virtues, it will be helpful to begin with the issue of ‘the reasons for the commandments’ (t’amei ha-mitzvot). While there is some disagreement over the precise number of commandments in Torah, Maimonides concurred with the most widely shared view, holding that they number six hundred thirteen. (Three hundred sixty-five are prohibitions and two hundred forty-eight are positive injunctions.) Along with some other medieval Jewish philosophers Maimonides held that fulfilling the commandments is not only a matter of practice but also study. Jews are to enlarge and deepen their understanding by striving to comprehend the reasons for the commandments, which is itself commanded. Jewish thinkers often quoted Deuteronomy as a locus of the commandment to seek understanding by reflecting upon the rational justifications of the commandments.  For example, Deuteronomy 4, 5-8, reads, ‘for this is your wisdom and your understanding in the sight of the peoples, that, when they hear all these statutes, shall say: “Surely this great nation is a wise and understanding people.”’

Maimonides held that there are reasons for all of the commandments. None is simply an arbitrary test of obedience. Moreover, he thought it an offense against divine wisdom that any commandment should be without reason. Some philosophers of the period argued for divine voluntarism, often as a way of preserving God’s sovereignty and power. Voluntarism had numerous highly influential Islamic proponents, but very few Jewish philosophers endorsed it. Scotus and Ockham are often described as propounding divine voluntarism, though their views are complex in ways that the ‘voluntarist’ label does not accurately apply.

Numerous Jewish thinkers distinguished between mishpatim and hukkim, that is, between judgments and statutes. The former are those commandments the reasons for which are ascertainable by human beings, and the latter are those commandments whose justifications are more opaque but, in the view of some, still rational. Saadia had distinguished between ‘laws of reason’ and ‘laws of revelation’ as a way of making the distinction. There was debate over whether some mishpatim (judgments) are fully evident to reason. Saadia held that view; Maimonides did not. Saadia’s view was very much like an intuitionist view regarding at least some of the commandments. The chief point here is that, in Maimonides’ view, all commandments are supported by rational justification, though none are rationally self-evident.

He wrote:

[E]very commandment from among these six hundred and thirteen commandments exists either with a view to communicating a correct opinion, or to putting an end to an unhealthy opinion, or to communicating a rule of justice, or to warding off an injustice, or to endowing men with a noble moral quality, or to warning them against an evil moral quality. Thus all [the commandments] are bound up with three things: opinions, moral qualities, and political civic actions (Guide, III, 31, p. 524).

He criticized voluntarism harshly, calling it a “sickness” of soul to think that lacking any rational purpose should be a mark that a law has a divine origin. Maimonides wrote, “It is, however, the doctrine of all of us—both of the multitude and of the elite—that all the Laws have a cause, though we ignore the causes for some of them and we do not know the manner in which they conform to wisdom” (Guide, III, 26, p. 507). In the midst of a discussion of the matter (chapter 31 of the Guide) he quotes the passage from Deuteronomy 4.  The ultimate, overall purpose “of the Law as a whole is to put an end to idolatry” (Guide, III, 29, p. 517). The purpose is realized through individuals acquiring good moral habits, seeking and preserving justice, and attaining understanding. Radical voluntarism would leave the commandments without purpose or point, when we can see that “all the commandments are bound up with three things: opinions, moral qualities, and political civic actions” (Guide, III, 31, p. 524). Sometimes he reduces the purpose of the Law overall to two ends, “the welfare of the soul and the welfare of the body” (Guide, III, 27, p. 510).


Maimonides held that fulfilling the commandments could help a person attain more understanding of the reasons for the commandments. He developed a complex, subtle view of the relations between ethical and intellectual virtue while endorsing an intellectualist conception of human perfection. He held that the more fully one understands the rational justifications for the commandments, the more one will be motivated to fulfill them. The motivation is increased by appreciation of the commandments’ wisdom. Thus, it is also part of his view that tradition is important not just as a way of sustaining ancient practices but also as transmitting understanding that can be enlarged and deepened.  There are several respects in which Maimonides’ thought has rationalistic tendencies, and this point about tradition as having authority because of its relation to reason and not just the authority of antiquity is a good example.

Maimonides did not acknowledge an intellectual virtue of practical wisdom. One important difference between Maimonides and Aristotle is that Maimonides regarded all virtues, apart from intellectual virtue, as choiceworthy only because they serve intellectual virtue. Preserving health and wellbeing and composing the soul are conditions for intellectual perfection. The virtues, other than intellectual virtue, are not in Maimonides’s view choice-worthy in their own right, independent of their relation to intellectual virtue. As David Shatz writes of Maimonides’ view:

His writings contain extensive discussion of ridding oneself of bad ethical traits and acquiring good ones, and of the attempt to “quell the impulses” of matter that distract people from intellectual pursuits and impede cognition of what is not physical. The quelling of such impulses is associated with the attainment of holiness (GP 3.8, 3.33). Morality is a preparation for contemplation and constitutes no trivial task (Shatz, p. 169).

In Chapter 54, which is the final chapter of the Guide, Maimonides distinguishes four species of perfection relevant to human beings. They are “the perfection of possessions” (material goods and resources), “the perfection of bodily constitution and shape” (such things as corporeal strength and temperament, which “[do] not belong to man qua man, but qua animal”), “the perfection of the moral virtues” (which he says is “preparation for something else and not an end in itself”), and finally, intellectual perfection, “[t]he true human perfection; it consists in the acquisition of the rational virtues… [T]hrough it man is man” (Guide, III, 54, p. 635).

The first three species of human virtue are conditions for the fourth species, which is the virtue by which one’s essence is actualized. Health, strength, and at least a modicum of material means are needed in order to engage in morally virtuous activity. The moral virtues are conditions for the composure and focus of mind required for intellectual virtue. Intellectual virtue is the individual’s true perfection, and it brings with it enduring permanence without corruption. Yet soon after making the pronounced case for human perfection as intellectual perfection, Maimonides concludes the Guide with a statement about how we imitate God to the fullest through loving-kindness, righteousness, and judgment. Unsurprisingly, there is considerable debate among scholars regarding just how Maimonides’ view is to be interpreted. One way to understand his view is that the first three perfections are choiceworthy as conditions and support for intellectual perfection, and to the extent to which one attains intellectual perfection, it will inform and be reflected in how one acts, and the activity mentioned at the conclusion of the Guide is imitation of God insofar as it is care for the created order, and finally, care is inseparable from the understanding of that order. In this view, the first three perfections of a human being are necessary for intellectual perfection, but intellectual perfection is then itself actualized in ethically excellent human action.

This may still seem to be problematically related to Maimonides’ statements about intellectual perfection as the distinctive and highest perfection of a human being. However, it suggests a way in which that notion of perfection can be in agreement with the significance Maimonides attaches to imitatio dei. In any case, the issue is an excellent example of the complexity of Maimonides’ thought and the subtlety and care with which he articulated it. His complex view cannot be dismissed as a clumsy lapse in consistency or the effect of inattention to what he said elsewhere.

Yet the Guide is also the work in which Maimonides explains Job’s suffering on the basis of the fact that, while Job was ethically virtuous, he was not said to excel in intellectual virtue. His imperfect understanding was at the root of Job’s perplexity over what befell him. If he had more perfect understanding, he would have understood that all is ordered for the best by divine providence. Maimonides connected intellectual virtue with providence in just that way; the more perfect one’s understanding, the more complete one’s protection from evil. Human beings mistakenly think that God’s knowledge is like our knowledge and that God’s purposes are like our own. That is, on our part, the error of displacing intellect with our imagination.

If man knows this, every misfortune will be borne lightly by him. And misfortunes will not add to his doubts regarding the deity and whether He does or does not know and whether He exercises providence or manifests neglect, but will, on the contrary, add to his love, as is said in the conclusion of the prophetic revelation in question: Wherefore I abhor myself, and repent of dust and ashes (Guide, III, 23, p. 497).

It is also a crucial part of Maimonides’ view of intellectual perfection that the love of God “is proportionate to apprehension” (Guide, III, 51, p. 621). The intellect emanating from God is the “bond” between God and human beings and “You have the choice: if you wish to strengthen and fortify this bond, you can do so; if, however, you wish gradually to make it weaker and feebler until you cut it, you can also do that” (Guide, III, 51, p. 621). Happiness is ultimately and essentially intellectual, even if in the aspiration to be holy and to imitate God, we act in the world in ways we understand to be God’s ways.

8. Some Key Elements of Moral Epistemology and Moral Psychology

The Law supplies the guidance for virtuous activity. We need to be careful in regard to this point. It is not Maimonides’ view that a person is to follow the law mechanically or without reflection or criticism. We saw above the central importance of seeking to enlarge and deepen understanding of the commandments. That involves questioning, dialectic, elaboration, and extending judgment to new sorts of cases. Thus, even though Maimonides’ ethics lacks a virtue of practical wisdom, reason and reasoning had a vital, extensive role in it.

Recall, also, that Maimonides held that good and evil relate to the imagination rather than the intellect. Again, it is important to be careful; this does not mean that Maimonides thought that good and evil are subjective or that there is no objective difference between being correct and being mistaken about them. He did not think that good and evil were objects of the intellect, but he did think that judgments of good and evil could be, or could fail to be, supported by reasons. The key contrast here is not between the rational and the conventional, or subjective, but between the demonstrable and the not demonstrable. Judgments of good and evil are not demonstrable but neither are they conventional. It is in the sciences that demonstration is possible, but that does not relegate ethical judgment to the sphere of the merely conventional, expressive, or subjective.

We can attain further clarity concerning this matter by considering Maimonides’ use of, what is translated as, the “generally accepted.” Maimonides uses the notion of the “generally accepted” in a number of places in the Guide. (See, for example, I, 2; also III, 29; III, 31; III, 32; and in “Eight Chapters,” Ch. VIII, p. 87) He seems to use it in two ways. In one sense, “generally accepted” refers to beliefs and practices widely held, whether or not they are true or supported by good reasons. For example, we might say that in ancient times it was generally accepted that the stars exercised causal power over the actions of human beings, causing them to do what they do (a view Maimonides opposed). That is a belief that was widely held, though it was false.

In the second sense, something may be said to be generally accepted insofar as it is widely held on the basis of good reasons, though not demonstrable. The matter in question is not known by intuition or demonstration, yet neither is it simply a matter of custom or longstanding convention. There are grounds for it such that it is a reasonable thing to maintain. Moral beliefs are generally accepted in that second sense. Thus, some of what is generally accepted God wishes to efface from our minds, as is the case with idolatrous beliefs, while some of what is generally accepted is important for us to believe and to employ as a basis for action. What is generally accepted, in this sense, is not merely a matter of being commonly believed. It is a matter of being a justified though non-demonstrable belief.

Above we noted that, according to Maimonides, there are reasons for all of the commandments. The reasons for them are not always evident, and in many cases, when we seek after them, will find that their justification remains elusive. For instance, we may be able to see that there is reason to punish certain kinds of conduct; it may be easily understood that certain action-types count as crimes or offenses. It may not be clear why the punishment is forty lashes rather than thirty-nine or forty-one. Perhaps we agree that sixty would be too many and ten would be too few. But why does the commandment tell us forty? In such cases Maimonides tells us that some number had to be chosen so that there would be clarity about what is required, and God had a reason for the degree of severity of the punishment even if it is not rationally evident that it must be forty. In some cases, even God simply has to make a choice within a range determined by his wisdom.

There is an important connection between this issue and the earlier discussion of the reasons for the commandments. Many of the statutes (hukkim) concern ritual, diet, the clean and the unclean, matters of dress, and a great many practices, some of which do not seem to have any easily discernible ethical significance. Maimonides argued that part of the explanation for some of them is that they were needed to orient the Israelites to proper worship of God when they were accustomed to the practices of the pagan peoples surrounding them. Part of the divine wisdom of the commandments is that they did not require a complete, abrupt change in practice, a change so radical that people would have resisted it on account of having no grasp of what they were being required to do. Instead, in a manner reflective of God’s “gracious ruse,” many of the commandments required sacrifice and other practices with which the Israelites were familiar. However, the Law overall, as an integrated, purposeful discipline of perfection, guided people to true belief and genuinely virtuous practice.

On the issue of why the commandments contain many requirements not so different from the practices of people from whom the Israelites were to be distinguished by their covenant with God, Maimonides wrote:

For a sudden transition from one opposite to another is impossible. And therefore man, according to his nature, is not capable of abandoning suddenly all to which he was accustomed. As therefore God sent Moses our Master to make out of us a kingdom of priests and a holy nation—through the knowledge of Him, may He be exalted, according to what he has explained” (Guide, III, 32, p. 526).

Recognizable practices oriented to a new purpose and having new meaning were required.

His wisdom, may He be exalted, and His gracious ruse, which is manifest in regard to all His creatures, did not require that He give us a Law prescribing the rejection, abandonment, and abolition of all these kinds of worship. For one could not then conceive the acceptance of [such a Law], considering the nature of man, which always likes that to which it is accustomed” (Guide, III, 32, p. 526).

This way the people would not reject what was being asked of them as alien and inscrutable. Maimonides, like Aristotle, regarded human beings as creatures of habit in very significant respects. This is one of the respects in which Aristotelian elements of philosophical anthropology and moral psychology are discernible in Maimonides.

These points are also relevant to Maimonides’ treatment of messianism. He argued that when the Messiah reigns there will be no fundamental change in human nature. The world will not be reordered except that it will be a time of universal peace. Israel will have political sovereignty restored to it, and peoples all over the world will engage in study, seeking scientific and philosophical understanding. The ways of the world will not be altered in any fundamental respect except that during the messianic era people will attain and exercise virtue. Moreover, fulfilling the commandments is necessary preparation for that. People need to prepare themselves for rule by the Messiah; until that preparation is done, messianic claims should be severely tested.

Habits and the importance of habituation figure prominently in “Eight Chapters” (Commentary on the Mishnah) and also in “Laws Concerning Character Traits,” (Mishneh Torah). “Eight Chapters” presents much of Maimonides’ moral psychology and the main claims in his conception of free will. In it we find very Aristotelian-sounding philosophical idioms being put to work in the service of some quite un-Aristotelian themes and theses. That the commandments are to be fulfilled has implications for the conception of free will and for the possibility of repentance and character change, and of course, there are many implications for what a human being needs to do in order to realize the perfection proper to humans. Maimonides’ conception of the virtues differs from Aristotle’s in some striking ways, though Maimonides still owes a great deal to Aristotle in respect to the conceptual architecture of virtue.

Like Aristotle, Maimonides emphasized the importance of regular practice, in contrast to any particular episode of decision, in acquiring a virtue. Like Aristotle, he understood virtues and vices as ethically and explanatorily significant states of character. Like Aristotle, he took many virtues to lie in a mean. “The general rule is that he follow the mean for every single character trait, until all his character traits are ordered according to the mean. That is in keeping with what Solomon says: ‘And all your ways will be upright’” (Maimonides, “Laws Concerning Character Traits,” in Ethical Writings of Maimonidess, p. 33).

In addition, Maimonides agreed that there is a vital role for excellent examples, persons of sound judgment and well-ordered dispositions of desire and affect. “It is a positive commandment to cleave to the wise men in order to learn from their actions” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 47). Such persons can be important models, shaping the aspirations of others. When one suffers a sickness of the soul, he is to “go to the wise men—who are physicians of the soul—and they will cure their disease by means of the character traits that they shall teach them, until they make them return to the middle way” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 31).

Like Aristotle, Maimonides recognizes the significance of the overall character of one’s community and the people by whom one is surrounded. Notwithstanding those and other important points of agreement, Maimonides’ ethics and his account of moral psychology include some elements very different from Aristotle’s views. The differences concern some fundamental, general features of moral psychology as well as the understanding of individual virtues and vices.

With regard to particular virtues Maimonides held that anger and pride are two aspects of our moral psychology that we should do our utmost to minimize. He goes so far as to say that a truly virtuous man will put on a show of anger—because it may be necessary as part of the project of habituating one’s children or making important ethical points to others—while not actually feeling anger. He regarded anger as quite threatening to composure of mind and to attention to God as one’s proper focus. In actually feeling anger the individual is disturbed and is taken over by passion in a way that can misguide judgment and action. That is to be avoided as completely as possible, even when it is appropriate to punish for example.

Because prophecy is ultimately an intellectual phenomenon, one cannot be a prophet if one’s passions are disturbed. Anger and sadness, for example, are impediments to prophecy. In “Laws Concerning Character Traits” Maimonides writes, “the wise men of old said: ‘Anyone who is angry—it is as if he worships idols.’ They said about anyone who is angry: If he is a wise man, his wisdom departs from him, and if he is a prophet, his prophecy departs from him” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits” p. 32). Distractions from intellectual focus and composure are impediments to prophecy.

Pride is another element of moral psychology without proper place in the virtuous person’s character. First of all, we are to be humble before God. We mentioned above the significance of awareness of our finiteness and smallness in contrast to God, and there is also the fact of the radical dependence of all things on God. Scripture says that Moses, the greatest prophet and the leader of the Israelites on their way to becoming a people through his leadership, was very humble. Thus, the sort of humility urged is not inconsistent with courage, resolve, excellent judgment, and the willingness to accept weighty responsibility. Humility concerns restraint of the ego, restraint of self-love in order to remain mindful of the needs and the welfare of others, and guarding against an inflated opinion of oneself and one’s own interests. Torah enjoins again and again to welcome the stranger, to care for the widow, the orphan, and the needy, and for the Israelites not to forget that they were once slaves in Egypt. Humility is a way of registering dependence, showing gratitude for existence and for being sustained, and appreciating the gift of Torah.

Pride and anger are two notable cases regarding which one is to aim for an extreme rather than the mean. “In the case of some character traits, a man is forbidden to accustom himself to the mean. Rather, he shall move to the other extreme. One such [character trait] is a haughty heart, for the good way is not that a man be merely humble, but that he have a lowly spirit, that his spirit be very submissive.”(“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 31)

Every man whose character traits all lie in the mean is called a wise man. Whoever is exceedingly scrupulous with himself and moves a little toward one side or the other, away from the character trait in the mean, is called a pious man. Whoever moves away from a haughty heart to the opposite extreme so that he is exceedingly lowly in spirit is a called a pious man. This is the measure of piety. If he moves only to the mean and is humble, he is called a wise man; this is the measure of wisdom(“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” pp. 29-30).

In general, Maimonides held that the commandments give human beings the discipline to acquire dispositions lying in the mean. “We are commanded to walk in these middle ways, which are the good and right ways. As it is said: ‘And you shall walk in His ways’” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 30). He referred to the middle way as “the way of the Lord” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 30). Thus, “[t]he Law forbids what it forbids and commands what it commands only for this reason, i.e., that we move away from one side as a means of discipline” (Maimonides, “Eight Chapters,” p. 71). He did, though, include the category of the pious in addition to the wise, noting the appropriateness of certain extremes to the pious.

Maimonides did not encourage severe asceticism and self-punishment. Like many other Jewish thinkers he held that the discipline of the commandments was discipline enough, “Therefore the wise men commanded that a man only abstain from things forbidden by the Torah” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 34). Quoting the sages, he asks, “‘Is what Torah has prohibited not enough for you, that you prohibit other things for yourself?’” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 34).

Maimonides made an important moral-psychological distinction between fulfilling the commandments that concern matters ascertainable by human reason, the things “generally accepted,” and those concerning matters of the “traditional laws,” that is, the hukkim. Those are what Saadia called “the laws of revelation” in contrast to “the laws of reason.” In regard to what is generally accepted, he quotes Talmud, writing, “If they were not written down, they would deserve to be written down.” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 80) The traditional laws make a different sort of demand on inclination and desire. They specify prohibitions that would not, just on the basis of what reason generally accepts, be arrived at. For that reason, there is greater virtue in fulfilling those commandments when it is a struggle to do so, while the person who is temperate with regard to what reason requires is better than the person who struggles to fulfill those commandments. With regard to murder, theft, fraud, repaying a benefactor with evil rather than gratitude, and so forth, it is better to have no desire to do what is prohibited.

With regard to the dietary laws, ritual laws, and so forth, there is greater virtue in successfully battling an inclination to do what is prohibited than in simply having no such desire. Thus, in the case of one type of commandment, virtue is superior to continence; in the case of the other type of commandment, continence, in the face of struggling against desire, is superior. This was Maimonides’ method of resolving what appeared to be a contradiction between what ‘the philosophers’ say and what ‘the sages’ say. It is, he asserts, “a marvelous subtlety and a wonderful reconciliation of the two views” (“Eight Chapters,” p. 80). This approach acknowledges the special difficulty involved with the ritual laws and commandments unique to the Jewish people. Maimonides saw that it would be unreasonable to expect people to be able to fulfill those on the basis of natural tendencies. One might have a natural disposition to be kind and compassionate, but no one has a natural disposition to fulfill say, the laws concerning specific practices associated with holy days, diet or sacrifices of specific types.

9. Freedom of the Will, Repentance, and Covenant

Two issues regarding which Maimonides’ views departed significantly from Aristotle’s are freedom of the will and repentance. Both are related in a significant respect. Repentance, as Maimonides understood it, is possible only if persons have free will and Maimonides insisted that the Law and the commandments would be pointless without freedom of the will:

If man’s actions were done under compulsion, the commandments and prohibitions of the Law would be nullified and they would all be absolutely in vain, since man would have no choice in what he does. Similarly, instruction and education, including instruction in all the productive arts, would necessarily be in vain an would all be futile (“Eight Chapters,” pp. 84-5).

He maintained that “[r]eward and punishment would also be sheer injustice, not be be [sic] meted out by some of us to others nor by God to us (“Eight Chapters,” p. 85).

There is no question that humans have free will. “The truth about which there is no doubt at all is that all of man’s actions are given over to him (“Eight Chapters,” p. 85). This is a robust version of ‘ought implies can,’ such that God’s wisdom and justice are at stake. The notion that a human being might lack freedom of the will is simply unsupportable, and Maimonides’ argument concerning the Law has a result that comports with his critique of astrological determinism.

Moreover, despite the weight he put on the importance of habits in shaping a person’s character and in the acquisition of virtues and vices, Maimonides also argued that even a mature individual is able to change his character through repentance. The regularly virtuous person is still able to sin, and the regularly vicious person is able to ethically reorient himself, connecting with the good through changing his dispositions and following the commandments.

Aristotle held that through the process of habituation, including how one habituates oneself, a person acquires a second nature, a developed character, which becomes fixed or very nearly fixed. The plasticity of one’s capacities is largely exhausted as a result of exercising them in specific ways such that certain specific states of character are formed. That’s just what it is to have a character. This does not mean that a person must be either soundly virtuous or profoundly vicious. Most people are continent rather than temperate, and they may never cease to struggle to some extent to do what virtue requires. In Aristotle’s view the chief point is that, whatever the extent of one’s virtues or vices, the individual is very likely to reach a condition in which states of character are firmly established. In having a character, one has dispositions of desire and emotion and engages in patterns and policies of reasoning in quite regular ways. In Aristotle’s view it would not be reasonable to expect of people in general that they should be able to change their mature characters.

Aristotle (especially in the Rhetoric) discusses certain characteristic features of persons at different stages in life—how young men differ from men late in life, and so forth. Still, his view was that one’s second nature, one’s ethically relevant dispositions to choose, to act, and to respond, tends to be stable rather than easily changed. The dispositions into which a person settles shape the person’s judgments, awareness, and deliberations. It is not as though there is rational agency and separate from that are elements of character. One’s character just is the form that one’s rational agency takes on account of how specific dispositions are reflected in one’s choices, actions, and responses. In this view the person established in vice may not even be able to recognize what virtue requires. After all, that person is settled in a (wrong) conception of what is worthwhile and desirable and may see no reason to revise that conception.  Even supposing that recognition of what virtue requires is possible, the vicious person may not have any effective desire to change.

For Maimonides it was crucial that a significant revision of a person’s dispositions is possible. That is a necessary condition of genuine repentance, which is something Maimonides held is never practically impossible. Even the person established in profound vices and enjoying vicious activities, can come to see what virtue requires and can achieve ethical reorientation.  It should be noted that there are a few instances in the Hebrew Bible in which God prevents a person from repenting and makes it impossible for that agent to do the right thing. The ‘hardening of Pharaoh’s heart’ just before the exodus from Egypt is a notable example. The difficulty of interpreting the morality of such a case made it a fixture of medieval Jewish philosophy. Maimonides addresses the instance explicitly. There is not space here to discuss it in depth. It is indeed a hard case but that is because it is at odds with another view that he held, namely, that people have freedom of the will adequate to repent genuinely.

The Law has a crucial role in helping people to achieve ethical reorientation. First, the Law supplies accessible guidance. Even if the people by whom one is surrounded are poor examples, an individual is not utterly cut off from direction and guidance concerning virtue. The Law provides accessible guidance in a way that is not part of Aristotle’s view. If there are no persons around with practical wisdom, an Aristotelian agent may not be able to ascertain what is virtuous and good. The guidance of actual exemplars is likely to be vitally important to the cultivation and encouragement of virtue given Aristotle’s moral psychology. Maimonides also thought that exemplars and the prevailing norms of the community are crucial. However, the Law provides a measure for who is to count as an exemplar. Its guidance is accessible in a way for which there is no counterpart in Aristotle’s ethical view. In “Laws of Repentance” Maimonides writes, “If one desires to turn towards the good way and be righteous, he has the power to do” (Maimonides, “Laws of Repentance,” V, 1). He says, “Every person turns to the way which he desires, spontaneously and of his own volition” (“Laws of Repentance,” V, 2). In the Guide Maimonides writes, “If then the individual believed that this fracture [the tendency to sin] can never be remedied, he would persist in his error and sometimes perhaps disobey even more because of the fact that no stratagem remains at his disposal” (Guide, III, 36, p. 540).

The Law also includes guidance regarding the practices through which repentance is possible. It shows persons what is involved in the effort to re-orient oneself to virtue. Repentance is not simply a matter of decision. It requires certain kinds of recognition, reflective self-knowledge, knowledge of what is really good, not only apparently good, and knowledge of the practices required to re-turn to God and to attain virtue. Maimonides acknowledged the ‘inertia,’ so to speak, of second nature, while also holding that a person can radically redirect volition. There are many commandments concerning repentance. Thus, the agent who is genuinely motivated to make the effort can know what is needed in order to make an effective effort.

This more libertarian conception of free will, at least in contrast to Aristotle, is connected with moral epistemology and important issues in moral psychology. The ‘ought’ of the commandments implies that we can do what is required, and in order to do what is required, we need to know what is required. In fact, the notion that what the Law requires is not too hard for human beings to grasp is an important principle in Jewish thought. Maimonides agreed with Aristotle in regard to each person being born with a certain temperament and having specific propensities and susceptibilities through no choice or fault of one’s own. However, Maimonides had a more optimistic conception of the depth of change one can bring about in one’s character, made possible by and through fulfilling the commandments.

In Aristotle’s view, happiness is attainable by a human being if the individual is fortunate with respect to external conditions and with respect to habituation by others, and if one habituates oneself in a sound manner. The core of happiness depends upon the self-determined agency of the individual but certain external conditions are also required. For some, something like the happiness of the gods may even be attainable. However, in Aristotle’s view there is not a notion of redemption or providential history as there is in the Abrahamic faith-traditions. There is, however, something like blessedness—the favor of the gods—but it is not a clear counterpart to monotheistic providence. In Judaism, providence and redemption are closely connected with the notion of covenant. Through the covenant they have an enduring relation with God, to whom they answer for their sins and by whom their virtue is to be rewarded.

Many related topics, such as repentance, worship, the aspiration to be holy, and responsibilities with respect to other members of the national community are to be understood through their connections with covenant. Like Aristotle, Maimonides attached considerable importance to the community in which one lives and the ways in which the public, social world can influence character:

A disciple of wise men is not permitted to live in any city that does not have these ten things: a physician, a surgeon, a bathhouse, a bathroom, a fixed source of water such as a river or spring, a synagogue, a teacher of children, a scribe, a collector of charity, and a court that can punish with lashes and imprisonment (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 41).

These are all needed in order for a person to live well. In addition, “It is a positive commandment to cleave to the wise men in order to learn from their actions” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 47). This emphasis on the community is connected with covenant inasmuch as the commandments are a comprehensive guide to life and not just ethical guidance or guidance for worship. Jewish law extends to all sorts of aspects of life, and there are not clear, systematic distinctions between criminal law and torts or between law and religion or ethics and religious life.

The Talmud, which is the written version of the Oral Law, covers everything from agricultural practice, to marriage, to tithing, to criminal procedure and sentences, to contracts, forgiveness, sexuality, and so forth. Some commandments could not be fulfilled because of the destruction of the Temple and the lack of a self-determining political entity. But Maimonides did not therefore maintain that those portions of the Law were irrelevant or ceased to be integral. Rather, they would have to wait upon the restoration of the Temple.

We noted above that Maimonides had an intellectualist conception of human nature. In the final chapters of the Guide he emphasizes this and claims, “Thus it is clear that after apprehension, total devotion to Him and the employment of intellectual thought in constantly loving Him should be aimed at. Mostly this is achieved in solitude and isolation. Hence every excellent man stays frequently in solitude and does not meet anyone unless it is necessary” (Guide, III, 51, p. 621). In “Laws Concerning Character Traits” Maimonides indicates several respects in which a man should be preoccupied with thought of God, even to the extent of feigning attention to more mundane matters. This is not because it is perfectly all right to ignore one’s spouse or children or neighbors but, rather, because this is how a person guards against pride and distraction from the true and the good. Indulging in gossip, bearing a grudge, idol worship, and illicit sexual union are all examples of how one can be led down a bad path of aroused passions and desires, harming oneself and others. Accordingly, “[i]t is proper for a man to overlook all things of the world, for according to those who understand, everything is vain and empty and not worth taking vengeance for” (“Laws Concerning Character Traits,” p. 52).

10. The Issue of Esotericism


The question of the relation between philosophy and revealed religion in Maimonides’ thought has motivated considerable debate. The chief point of dispute is whether Maimonides actually held that the claims of revealed religion are untenable and that his works deliberately disguise his true convictions, namely that the claims of reason leave no place for revealed religion. Thus, advocates of the view maintain that there is a deep political purpose to a work such as the Guide; it supports the claims of revealed religion and its tradition by appearance only in order not to undermine and demoralize the many Jews for whom fidelity to the tradition shaped their world and their lives. Critics of the case for Maimonidean esotericism agree that Maimonides’ views are complex, involve apparent contradictions, and that he presents part of a line of reasoning in one place and other parts in other places without clear signals, especially in the Guide. However, they argue that there is a consistent, undisguised theme of explicating religion in philosophical terms because of his genuine commitment to philosophy and tradition.

Maimonides’ thought aroused controversy during and after his life, and it has influenced important philosophers in diverse ways. It is a rationalistic understanding of Judaism and at the same time it ascribes fundamental importance to tradition. It includes many distinctively medieval elements and aspects, yet it manages to remain relevant through the ways it formulates and addresses some of the most fundamental questions concerning philosophy, religion, and the relations between them.

11. Conclusion


Maimonides’ negative theology and the rationalistic valence of his thought influenced Aquinas, and later, Leibniz and Spinoza. Maimonides and Spinoza are similar in the respect that the relation between philosophy and theism in their thought is complex, controversial, and continues to motivate vigorous debate. In the context of the recently growing interest in more and more figures and periods of the history of philosophy, the medievals are certainly benefiting, being read and studied much more widely than, say, twenty-five or thirty years ago, no less fifty or a hundred years ago. A good deal of fine scholarship on Maimonides, and Spinoza too, has been published in the late twentieth and early twenty-first centuries, and much of it concerns the relations between philosophy and religion. Scholarly debates abound, and in the present discussion I have only hinted at some of the most important of them. One of the benefits of the increased attention to the history of philosophy is that increasing numbers of scholars and students of philosophy are recognizing the profound and ambitious originality of Maimonides’ thought. It is certainly not ‘Aristotle plus Judaism,’ a formulation that barely makes sense.

Maimonides developed an original, important conception of how a tradition anchored in revelation can be understood in philosophically rationalistic terms. As long as we are careful with jargon, we can say that he elaborated a broadly rationalistic conception of revealed religion, wringing out of it mystery, superstition, and any elements inconsistent with truths of reason. It is not difficult to see how his thought could have influenced seventeenth century rationalists.

Among them, Spinoza was a vehement critic of traditional Judaism, and yet there are respects in which his project and Maimonides’ share important features. Spinoza wanted to isolate and separate out from religion whatever rational truths may be embedded in it. In a sense, that is what Maimonides was doing though he argued that a great deal more of the concrete, practical content of the faith-tradition could be shown to be rationally justifiable. His anthropology was, perhaps, less optimistic than Spinoza’s. Maimonides and Spinoza were both centrally concerned with how we are to understand God and God’s relation to everything else. Their views of this matter diverge in decisive ways; after all, Spinoza held that God and nature are one, and Maimonides held that God transcends everything else so completely that we can only attain any understanding of God by way of a negative theology. But in each philosopher’s thought there is a crucial commitment to the notion that happiness depends upon understanding and that a human being’s deepest and most enduring gratifications are attained through disciplined desires and passions along with understanding. There is a deep-seated Stoic-like dimension to Spinoza’s thought, and though the metaphysics is very different from Spinoza’s, Maimonides’ thought also has some Stoic resonances in the way in which it understands relations between reason, freedom, perfection, and the enjoyment of them.

Maimonides was able to influence non-Jewish philosophers because his thought concerns themes and questions that are not ‘local’ to Judaism, even though the way that he pursues those themes and questions is deeply Jewish and attuned to details of Jewish tradition and Jewish life. Still, he understood Judaism as concerned with human perfection. For Maimonides fulfillment of the commandments and fidelity to tradition enable an individual to be perfected as a human being not merely as an excellent Jew. He insisted that no prophecy could exceed Moses’ and that Torah is a perfect instrument for guiding a person to perfection, but the notion of perfection involved in this view includes no element of mystery or an essentialism of a particular people.

In Maimonides’ view, being a Jew is a matter of a person’s ethical and intellectual convictions and commitments, rather than exclusively a matter of ethnicity or lineage. At the same time, the particular history and traditions of the Jewish people had fundamental significance to Maimonides. His philosophy is a powerful, intriguing, and challenging example of the project of finding and articulating universally significant principles, commitments, and ideals in the life and history of a particular people.

12. References and Further Reading

This is a selective bibliography. Maimonides himself wrote a great deal, and the number of works on Maimonides is extensive. This list includes Maimonides’ most important works relevant to philosophy and some of the most important scholarly and interpretive literature on Maimonides.

  • Berman, Lawrence V., “Maimonides, the Disciple of Alfarabi,” in J.A. Buijs (ed.), Maimonides: A Collection of Critical Essays, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988.
  • Berman, Lawrence V., “Maimonides on the Fall of Man,” AJS Review, 5, 1980, pp. 1–16.
  • J. David Bleich, “Judaism and Natural Law,” The Jewish Law Annual, Vol. VII, 1988, pp. 5-42.
    • Bleich presents a helpful analysis of whether Maimonides’ ethical thought should be interpreted as a version of natural law theorizing.
  • David Burrell, Freedom and Creation in Three Traditions, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1993.
    • The essays in this book supply illuminating comparisons of how some of the fundamental elements of Abrahamic monotheism are to be understood in Christian, Jewish, and Islamic thought. The author’s endorsement of Thomistic views on many of the issues comes across clearly.
  • Herbert Davidson, Moses Maimonides. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005.
  • Marvin Fox, Interpreting Maimonides, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1990.
    • Fox’s interpretation of Maimonides is an attempt to explicate how his views are closer to a certain understanding of Orthodox Judaism than to philosophical views. While Fox’s analysis has been heavily criticized, it is valuable for how it explains Maimonides’ fidelity to religious orthodoxy.
  • Daniel Frank, ‘Reason in Action: The ‘Practicality of Maimonides’ Guide’ in Daniel H. Frank (ed.), Commandment and Community: New Essays in Jewish Legal and Political Philosophy, Albany: SUNY Press, 2002, pp. 69–84.
  • Daniel Frank, “Maimonides and Medieval Jewish Aristotelianism,” in The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Jewish Philosophy, eds., Daniel H. Frank, Oliver Leaman, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Daniel Frank, Oliver Leaman, eds., The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Jewish Philosophy, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Saadia Gaon: The Book of Beliefs & Opinions, trans. by Samuel Rosenblatt, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1976.
    • Saadia set much of the agenda of medieval Jewish philosophy. While Maimonides criticizes him on various matters and objected to Saadia’s philosophical method, study of Saadia is very valuable for understanding the main concerns of medieval Jewish philosophy, especially the current of thought defending Judaism as a religion of reason.
  • Lenn E. Goodman, God of Abraham, New York: Oxford University Press, 1996.
    • This book is a helpful study of many of the main themes of Judaism as a monotheistic religion and Maimonides’ place in the elaboration of those themes.
  • Abraham Halkin and David Hartman, eds., Crisis and Leadership: Epistles of Maimonides, Philadelphia: Jewish Publication Society, 1985.
    • This work contains important shorter works of Maimonides and The Epistle to Yemen mentioned in Section 1 of this article.
  • David Hartman, Torah and Philosophic Quest, Philadelphia: The Jewish Publication Society, 1976.
  • Warren Zev Harvey, “A Portrait of Spinoza as a Maimonidean,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 19, 1981.
  • Barry Holtz, ed., Back to The Sources: Reading the Classic Jewish Texts, New York: Simon & Schuster, 1986.
    • An excellent collection of essays on the various texts central to Judaism that explains the places of Scripture, Talmud, Midrash, Kabbala, biblical commentary, and philosophical works in the Jewish tradition(s). This is very helpful on account of the large number of references Maimonides makes to several of these texts.
  • Isaac Husik, A History of Mediaeval Jewish Philosophy, New York, Macmillan, 1916.
    • This is a classic study still worth consulting despite being written nearly a century ago.
  • Jonathan Jacobs, Law, Reason, and Morality in Medieval Jewish Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2010.
    • This work, focusing on Saadia, Maimonides, and Bahya ibn Pakuda, argues that many elements of their views remain relevant to fundamental questions of metaethics and moral psychology.
  • Jonathan Jacobs, ‘The Epistemology of Moral Tradition: A Defense of aMaimonidean Thesis,” Review of Metaphysics, 64, 1, September 2010, pp. 55-74.
    • Jacobs argues for the claim that Maimonides developed a view of the ‘non-evident rationality’ of tradition and that tradition can be a mode of access to objective ethical understanding.
  • Jonathan Jacobs, “The Reasons of the Commandments: Rational Tradition without Natural Law,” in Reason, Religion and Natural Law: Plato to Spinoza, ed. Jonathan Jacobs, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012.
    • The author argues that while there are significant points of overlap between Maimonides’ ethical thought and natural law, there are important reasons not to interpret the former as a version of the latter. This has especially to do with the epistemic role of tradition in Maimonides’ thought.
  • Menachem Kellner, Maimonides on Human Perfection, Providence: Brown Judaic Studies, 1990.
    • This is a brief but valuable study of Maimonides’ intellectualist conception of human perfection.
  • Menachem Kellner, Maimonides on Judaism and the Jewish People, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1991.
    • This work explicates how Maimonides’ conception of Judaism differed from other, important conceptions by focusing on the role of intellectual commitments rather than a distinct nature or essence of the Jewish people.
  • Joel Kraemer, ed., Perspectives on Maimonides, Portland: Littman Library of Jewish Civilization, 1996.
  • Joel Kraemer, Maimonides: The Life and World of One of Civilization’s Greatest Minds, New York: Doubleday, 2008.
    • This is an important, recent biography exploring Maimonides’ life and thought in considerable detail.
  • Howard Kreisel, “Imitatio Dei in Maimonides’ Guide of the Perplexed,” AJS Review, 19/2, 1994, pp. 169-211.
  • Kreisel, Howard T., Maimonides’ Political Thought: Studies in Ethics, Lawand the Human Ideal, Albany: SUNY Press, 1999.
  • Kreisel, Howard T., Prophecy: The History of an Idea in Medieval Jewish Philosophy, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 2001.
  • Manekin, Charles, On Maimonides. Belmont, CA.: Wadsworth, 2005.
  • Moses Maimonides: “Eight Chapters,” in Ethical Writings of Maimonides, ed. by Raymond L. Weiss, Charles Butterworth, New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1975.
    • In this work Maimonides presents many of the main elements of his account of moral psychology, virtue, and freedom of the will. The Aristotelian resonances are pronounced, but there are also important departures from Aristotle.
  • Moses Maimonides, “Laws Concerning Character Traits,” in Ethical Writings of Maimonides, ed. by Raymond L. Weiss, Charles Butterworth, New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1975.
    • In this work the differences between Maimonides and Aristotle in regard to ethics are evident, especially regarding the role of the mean.
  • Moses Maimonides, “Laws of Repentance,” in Mishneh Torah Book of Knowledge, trans. by Moses Hyamson, Jerusalem: Feldheim Publishers, 1981.
    • In the course of presenting his account of repentance and what is required for it to be genuine, Maimonides also presents important claims and arguments regarding freedom of the will.
  • Moses Maimonides, Guide of the Perplexed trans. by Shlomo Pines, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1963.
  • Moses Maimonides, Mishneh Torah, “Hilkhot Avel,” 14:1, from A Maimonides Reader, ed. Isadore Twersky, Springfield: Behrman House, 1972.
  • Maimonides, “Basic Principles of the Torah,” Ch. 1, reprinted in A Maimonides Reader, ed. Isadore Twersky, Springfield, NJ: Behrman House, Inc., 1972.
  • Moses Maimonides, A Maimonides Reader, ed. Isadore Twersky, Springfield, NJ: Behrman House, Inc., 1972.
  • Moses Maimonides, Mishneh Torah, trans. Moses Hyamson, Jerusalem: Feldheim Publishers, 1981.
  • Moses Maimonides, Maimonides’ Introduction to His Commentary on the Mishnah, trans. Fred Rosner, Lanham, MD: Jason Aronson, 1994.
  • Louis Newman, “Ethics as Law, Law as Religion: Reflections on the Problem of Law and Ethics in Judaism,” in Contemporary Jewish Ethics and Morality, eds., Elliot N. Dorff, Louis E. Newman, New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
    • This and the following two works take up the issue of the relation between Jewish law and ethics, explicating key points of similarity and difference.
  • Louis Newman, “Law, Virtue, and Supererogation in the Halakha,” in Past Imperatives: Studies in the History and Theory of Jewish Ethics, Albany: SUNY Press, 1998.
  • David Novak, “Natural Law, Halakha, and the Covenant, in Contemporary Jewish Ethics and Morality, eds. Elliot N. Dorff, Louis E. Newman, New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • David Novak, Natural Law in Judaism, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
    • Novak defends the view that Maimonides should be interpreted as holding a natural law approach to ethics, despite the fact that ‘natural law’ was not part of the idiom he used.
  • Tamar Rudavsky, “Natural Law in Judaism: A Reconsideration,” in Reason, Religion, and Natural Law: From Plato to Spinoza, ed. Jonathan Jacobs, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012.
    • This essay defends the view that Maimonides’ ethical thought involved natural law elements. Rudavsky’s argument differs from Novak’s and does not include the Kantian elements found in Novak’s analysis.
  • Daniel Rynhold, An Introduction to Medieval Jewish Philosophy, London: I. B. Taurus & Co., Ltd., 2009.
  • Saadia Gaon, The Book of Beliefs & Opinions, trans., Samuel Rosenblatt, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1976.
  • Kenneth Seeskin, Searching For a Distant God: The Legacy of Maimonides, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Kenneth Seeskin, “Metaphysics and Its Transcendence,” in The Cambridge Companion to Maimonides, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2005, p. 89.
  • Kenneth Seeskin, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Maimonides, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
    • This work contains chapters on all of the main topical areas of Maimonides’ philosophical thought.
  • David Shatz,  “Maimonides’ Moral Theory,” The Cambridge Companion to Maimonides, ed. Kenneth Sesskin, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2005, pp. 167-192.
  • M. S. Stern, “Al-Ghazali, Maimonides, and Ibn Paquda on Repentance: A Comparative Model,” Journal of the American Academy of Religion, XLVII/4, pp. 589-607.
    • Repentance is an important issue in all three of the Abrahamic monotheistic traditions, and this article examines some of the chief points of similarity between important Islamic and Jewish thinkers.
  • Shubert Spero, Morality, Halakha and the Jewish Tradition, New York: KTAV Publishing House, Inc., 1983.
  • Baruch Spinoza, Theological-Political Treatise, 2nd ed., trans., Samuel Shirley, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 2007.
    • Spinoza was a harsh critic of traditional Judaism and this work contains important elements of his critique while also exhibiting aspects of Maimonides’ influence on Spinoza.
  • Leo Strauss,  “The Literary Character of the Guide for the Perplexed,” in Persecution and the Art of Writing. Glencoe, IL, The Free Press, 1952.
    • Leo Strauss has been a key voice in making the argument for the esotericism of Maimonides’ writings. Readers interested in the debate concerning esotericism may wish to consult Strauss’s works.
  • Leo Strauss, Philosophy and Law: Contributions to the Understanding of Maimonides and His Predecessors, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1995.
  • Sarah Stroumsa, Maimonides in His World, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2009.
  • Isadore Twersky, Introduction to the Code of Maimonides, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1980.
    • This is an in-depth study of Maimonides’ conception of the relation between law (the commandments) and philosophy. Twersky explains Maimonides’ view that Torah contains philosophical wisdom and how that philosophical wisdom can be found and elaborated.
  • Isadore Twersky, ed., Studies in Maimonides, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Center for Jewish Studies, 1990.


Author Information

Jonathan Jacobs
City University of New York
U. S. A.

Philosophy of Religion

Philosophy of religion is the philosophical study of the meaning and nature of religion. It includes the analyses of religious concepts, beliefs, terms, arguments, and practices of religious adherents. The scope of much of the work done in philosophy of religion has been limited to the various theistic religions. More recent work often involves a broader, more global approach, taking into consideration both theistic and non-theistic religious traditions. The range of those engaged in the field of philosophy of religion is broad and diverse and includes philosophers from the analytic and continental traditions, Eastern and Western thinkers, religious believers and agnostics, skeptics and atheists. Philosophy of religion draws on all of the major areas of philosophy as well as other relevant fields, including theology, history, sociology, psychology, and the natural sciences.

There are a number of themes that fall under the domain of philosophy of religion as it is commonly practiced in academic departments in North America and Europe. The focus here will be limited to six: (1) religious language and belief, (2) religious diversity, (3) concepts of God / Ultimate Reality, (4) arguments for and against the existence of God, (5) problems of evil and suffering, and (6) miracles.

Table of Contents

  1. Religious Language and Belief
    1. Logical Positivism
    2. Realism and Non-realism
  2. Religious Diversity
    1. Religious Pluralism
    2. Religious Relativism
    3. Religious Exclusivism
  3. Concepts of God/Ultimate Reality
  4. Arguments for and against the Existence of God
    1. Ontological Arguments
    2. Cosmological Arguments
    3. Teleological Arguments
    4. The Challenge of Science
    5. The Coherence of Theism
  5. Problems of Evil and Suffering
    1. Logical Problems
    2. Evidential Problems
    3. Theodicy
    4. The Hiddenness of God
    5. Karma and Reincarnation
  6. Miracles
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Religious Language and Belief

a. Logical Positivism

The practice of philosophy, especially in the analytic tradition, places emphasis on precision of terms and clarity of concepts and ideas. Religious language is often vague, imprecise, and couched in mystery. In the twentieth century this linguistic imprecision was challenged by philosophers who used a principle of verifiability to reject as meaningless all non-empirical claims. For these logical positivists, only the tautologies of mathematics and logic, along with statements containing empirical observations or inferences, were taken to be meaningful. Many religious statements, including those about God, are neither tautological nor empirically verifiable. So a number of religious claims, such as “Yahweh is compassionate” or “Atman is Brahman,” were considered by the positivists to be cognitively meaningless. When logical positivism became prominent mid-century, philosophy of religion as a discipline became suspect.

By the latter half of the twentieth century, however, many philosophers came to the conclusion that the positivists’ radical empiricist claims and verificationist criteria of meaning were problematic or self-refuting. This development, along with other factors including the philosophical insights on the nature and meaning of language offered by Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889–1951) and the rise of a pragmatic version of naturalism offered by W. V. O. Quine (1908–2000), caused logical positivism to wane. By the 1970s verificationism virtually collapsed, and philosophical views that had been suppressed, including those having to do with religion and religious language, were once again fair game for philosophical discourse. With the work of certain analytic philosophers of religion, including Basil Mitchell (1917–2011), H. H. Farmer (1892–1981), Alvin Plantinga (1932–), Richard Swinburne (1934–), and John Hick (1922–), religious language and concepts were revived and soon became accepted arenas of viable philosophical and religious discourse and debate.

b. Realism and Non-realism

After the collapse of positivism, two streams emerged in philosophy of religion regarding what religious language and beliefs are about: realism and non-realism. The vast majority of religious adherents are religious realists. Realists, as used in this context, are those who hold that their religious beliefs are about what actually exists, independent of the persons who hold those beliefs. Assertions about Allah or Brahman, angels or demons, resurrection or reincarnation, for example, are true because, in part,  there are actual referents for the words “Allah,” “Brahaman,” and so forth. The implication is that statements about them can and do provide correct predications of the behavior of Allah and Brahman and so forth. If Allah or Brahman do not actually exist, assertions about them would be false. Non-realists are those who hold that religious claims are not about realities that transcend human language, concepts, and social forms; religious claims are not about realities “out there”; they are not about objectively existing entities. Religion is a human construct and religious language refers to human behavior and experience.

An important figure who had much influence on the development of religious non-realism was Ludwig Wittgenstein. In his later works, Wittgenstein understood language to be not a fixed structure directly corresponding to the way things actually are, but rather a human activity susceptible to the vicissitudes of human life and practice. Language does not provide a picture of reality, he argued, but rather presents a set of activities which he dubbed “language games.” In learning language, one needs to be able to respond to words in various contexts; speech and action work together. In many cases, then, the meaning of a word is its use in the language. For Wittgenstein, this is true in all forms of discourse, including religious discourse. In speaking of God or other religious terms or concepts, their meanings have more to do with their use than with their denotation. The language games of the religions reflect the practices and forms of life of the various religious adherents; religious statements should not be taken as providing literal descriptions of a reality that somehow lies beyond those activities.

Some non-realists have been highly critical of religion, such as Sigmund Freud (1856–1939). Others, such as Don Cupitt (1934–), have sought to transform religion. Cupitt, a philosopher, theologian, and former priest in the Church of England, rejects historic religious dogma for, he maintains, it encompasses an outdated realist metaphysics and cosmology. He also abandons the notion of objective and eternal truth and replaces it with truth as a human improvisation. His approach to religion is to translate dogma and doctrine into a spirituality of practice where they become guiding myths to live by in this life, and they lead the believer to give up belief in a supernatural afterlife beyond the grave.

Non-realists have noted the alleged failure of realism to provide evidences or justifications for the truths of any particular religion, or of religion in general, and argue that projects in natural theology—the attempt to demonstrate the existence of God from evidence found in the natural world—are abject failures. Another point made by non-realists is that, since religious claims and practices are always done within a particular human context, and since the mind structures all perception within that context, the meanings of these claims are determined and limited by that context. To affirm a transcendent realm is to go beyond these contexts and structures.

Various responses to these claims have been offered by religious realists. Regarding the claim that there is no rational justification for religious beliefs, some realists agree. Nevertheless, these fideists claim that religion does not require evidence and justification; religion is about faith and trust, not evidence. Other realists, sometimes referred to as evidentialists, disagree and claim that while faith is fundamental to religion, or at least to some religions, there are in fact good arguments and evidences for religious truth claims. Yet another group of realists are commonly referred to as “Reformed epistemologists” (the term “Reformed” refers to the Christian, Calvinist Reformation theological tradition). Three of its leading proponents are Alvin Plantinga (1932–), Nicholas Wolterstorff (1932–), and William Alston (1921–). Reformed epistemology is non-evidentialist as it asserts that evidence (in the sense that evidentialists use the term) is not required in order for one’s faith to be justified. Unlike fideism, though, its adherents maintain that belief in God can be a rational endeavor despite a lack of evidence. This is contrary to the evidentialist approach in which it is irrational to believe a claim without evidence. It is also unlike evidentialism in that its adherents are generally opposed to classical foundationalism—the view that all justified beliefs must either be properly basic or derivative of properly basic beliefs.

Regarding the claim that religious statements, concepts, and beliefs exist only within a given social context, some realists have responded by noting that, while much of what occurs in religious discourse and practice is of human origin, one need not affirm a reductionist stance in which all religious meanings and symbols are reducible to human constructs.

2. Religious Diversity

In the West, most work done in philosophy of religion historically has been theistic. More recently, there has been a growing interest in religions and religious themes beyond the scope of theism. While awareness of religious diversity is not a new phenomenon, philosophers of religion from both the East and the West are becoming increasingly more aware of and interactive with religious others. It is now common to see contributions in Western philosophy of religion literature on various traditions, including Hinduism, Buddhism, Daoism, Confucianism, and African religions.

While interest in Eastern religion and comparative religion have brought about a deeper understanding of and appreciation for the different non-theistic religious traditions, it has also brought to the fore an awareness of the many ways the different traditions conflict. Consider some examples: for Buddhists there is no creator God, whereas Muslims affirm that the universe was created by the one true God, Allah; for Advaita Vedanta Hindus, the concept of Ultimate Reality is pantheistic monism in which only Brahman exists, whereas Christians affirm theistic dualism in which God exists as distinct from human beings and the other created entities; for Muslims and Christians, salvation is the ultimate goal whereby human beings are united with God forever in the afterlife, while the Buddhists’ ultimate goal is nirvana—an extinguishing of the individual self and complete extinction of all suffering. Many other examples could be cited as well. For the realist, at least, not all of these claims can be true. How is one to respond to this diversity of fundamental beliefs?

a. Religious Pluralism

One response to religious diversity is to deny or minimize the doctrinal conflicts and to maintain that doctrine itself is not as important for religion as religious experience and that the great religious traditions are equally authentic responses to Ultimate Reality. This is one form of religious pluralism. Its most ardent defender has been John Hick. Utilizing Immanuel Kant’s (1724–1804) distinctions of noumena (things as they are in themselves) and phenomena (things as they are experienced), Hick argues that a person’s experiences, religious and non-religious, depend on the interpretive frameworks and concepts through which one’s mind structures and comprehends them. While some people experience and comprehend Ultimate Reality in personal, theistic categories (as Allah or Yahweh, to mention two), others do so in impersonal, pantheistic ways (as nirguna Brahman, for example). Yet others experience and comprehend Ultimate Reality as non-personal and non-pantheistic (as Nirvana or the Tao). We do not know which view is ultimately correct (if any of them are, and for Hick Ultimate Reality is far beyond human conceptions) since we do not have a “God’s eye” perspective by which to make such an assessment. One common illustration of the pluralist position of experiencing God is the Hindu parable of the blind men and the elephant. In this parable, God is like an elephant surrounded by several blind men. One man felt the elephant’s tail and believed it to be a rope. Another felt his trunk and believed it to be a snake. Another felt his leg and believed it to be a tree. Yet another felt his side and believed it to be a wall. Each of them experience the same elephant but in very different ways from the others. In our experiences and understandings of Ultimate Reality, we are very much like the blind men, argue such religious pluralists, for our beliefs and viewpoints are constricted by our enculturated concepts.

Hick argues for what he calls the “pluralistic hypothesis”: that Ultimate Reality is ineffable and beyond our understanding but that its presence can be experienced through various spiritual practices and linguistic systems offered within the religions. The great world religions, then, constitute very different but equally valid ways of conceiving, experiencing, and responding to Ultimate Reality. He uses different analogies to describe his hypothesis, including an ambiguous picture of a duck-rabbit. A culture that has ducks but no familiarity with rabbits would see the ambiguous diagram as a duck. People in this culture would not even be aware of the ambiguity. So too with the culture that has rabbits but no familiarity with ducks. People in this culture would see the diagram as a rabbit. Hick’s point is that the ineffable is experienced in the different traditions as Vishnu, or as Allah, or as Yahweh, or as the Tao, and so on, depending on one’s individual and cultural concepts.

One objection to pluralism of this sort is that it leads to a dilemma, neither horn of which pluralists will want to affirm. On the one hand, if we do not have concepts that are in fact referring to Ultimate Reality as it is in itself, then we have landed in religious skepticism. On the other hand, if we do have concepts that describe actual properties of Ultimate Reality, then we are not epistemically blind after all, and therefore we could, theoretically at least, be in a position to make evaluations about different claims that are made about Ultimate Reality from the various religious traditions.

Another version of religious pluralism attempts to avoid some of the difficulties of the pluralistic hypothesis. For the aspectual pluralist, there is an objective Ultimate Reality which can be knowable to us. Unlike the pluralistic hypothesis, and in very non-Kantian fashion, valid descriptions of the noumenal are possible. Peter Byrne argues that each of the different major religious traditions reflects some aspect of the transcendent. Byrne uses the notion of natural kinds in order to clarify his view. Just as the natural kind gold has an unobservable essence as well as observable properties or qualities—being yellow, lustrous, and hard—so too Ultimate Reality has an essence with different experienced manifestations. Ultimate Reality manifests different aspects of itself in the different religions given their own unique conceptual schemes and practices.

One challenge to this form of pluralism is that, since each of the religions is capturing only an aspect of the transcendent, it seems that one would obtain a better understanding of its essence by creating a new syncretistic religion in order to glean a more comprehensive understanding of Ultimate Reality. Also, since religious adherents are only glimpsing the transcendent through properties which are themselves enculturated within the various traditions, descriptions of Ultimate Reality cannot offer adequate knowledge claims about it. So one is left with at least a mitigated form of religious skepticism.

b. Religious Relativism

A second way of responding to the conflicting claims of the different traditions is to remain committed to the truth of one set of religious teachings while at the same time agreeing with some of the central concerns raised by pluralism. Religious relativism provides such a response. For religious relativism, as articulated by Joseph Runzo, the correctness of a religion is relative to the worldview of its community of adherents. On this view, each of the religious traditions are comprised of various experiences and mutually incompatible truth claims, and the traditions are themselves rooted in distinct worldviews that are incompatible with, if not contradictory to, the other worldviews. Runzo maintains that these differing experiences and traditions emerge from the plurality of phenomenal realities experienced by the adherents of the traditions. On this relativistic view, one’s worldview—that is, one’s total cognitive web of interrelated concepts and beliefs—determines how one comprehends and experiences Ultimate Reality. Furthermore, there are incompatible yet adequate truth claims that correspond to the various worldviews, and the veracity of a religion is determined by its adequacy to appropriately correspond to the worldview within which it is subsumed. An important difference between the religious relativist and the pluralist is that, for the relativist and not the pluralist, truth itself is understood to be relative.

Relativism may offer a more coherent account of religious conflict than pluralism, but it can be argued that it falls short of the actual beliefs of religious adherents. For most religious adherents, their beliefs are generally understood to be true in an objective sense. This leads to the third, and most commonly held, response to conflicting religious claims.

c. Religious Exclusivism

In contrast to pluralism and relativism is a third response to the conflicting truth claims of the religions: exclusivism. The term is used in different ways in religious discourse, but a common element is that the central tenets of one religion are true, and claims which are incompatible with those tenets are false. Another common and related element is that salvation is found exclusively in one religion. Regarding the truth claim, for example, for a Muslim exclusivist, Allah is the one true God who literally spoke to the prophet Muhammad in space and time. Since that is true, then the Advaita Vedantan claim that Brahman (God) is nirguna—without attributes—must be false, for these two understandings of Ultimate Reality contradict one another. The same is the case for all religious exclusivists; since they take their religious claims to be objectively true, the contrary claims of other religions are false. This does not mean that exclusivists are not self-critical of their own beliefs, nor does it rule out the practice of dialoguing with or learning from religious others. But it does mean that religious differences are real and that there are intractable disagreements among religious traditions. Religious exclusivism (of which Alvin Plantinga is one prominent example) has been the most widely held position among the adherents of the major world religions.

Various responses have been made to exclusivism, including moral objections (such as that the exclusivist is arrogant, dishonest, oppressive) and intellectual and epistemic objections (including claims that the exclusivist holds unjustified or irrational beliefs).

3. Concepts of God/Ultimate Reality

A major theme among philosophers of religion in the West has been that of God, including questions about the nature and existence of God, challenges to the existence of God, language about God, and so on. Within every major religion is a belief about a transcendent reality underlying the natural, physical world. From its beginnings, philosophy of religion has been concerned with reflecting on, as far as possible, how religions might understand Ultimate Reality. How the various religions conceptualize that reality differs, especially between Eastern and Western religions. In Western religion, primarily the three religions of Abrahamic descent—Judaism, Christianity, and Islam—Ultimate Reality is conceived of and described in terms of a personal God who is creator and sustainer of all and perfect in every respect. Many other properties are commonly attributed to God as well, including omniscience, omnipotence, and immutability.

In much of Eastern religion, including Buddhism, Taoism, and the Advaita Vedanta school of Hinduism, Ultimate Reality is understood quite differently. It is not a personal creator God, but an absolute state of being. It cannot be described by a set of attributes, such as omniscience or omnipotence, for it is undifferentiated Absolute Reality. Taoists refer to it as the Tao; Hindus refer to it as Brahman; for Buddhists, the name varies and includes Shunyata and Nirvana. These different conceptions of Ultimate Reality bring with them distinct understandings of other significant issues as well, such as salvation/liberation, life after death, and evil and suffering, among others.

There is a recent view of Ultimate Reality articulated by philosopher of religion John Schellenberg that he has dubbed “ultimism,” which is neither theistic nor pantheistic. According to this view, the best one can do from a religious perspective is to have faith that there exists a metaphysically and axiologically ultimate reality and that from this reality an ultimate good can be attained.

4. Arguments for and against the Existence of God

It is generally the case that religious adherents do not hold their religious convictions because of well-articulated reasons or arguments which support those convictions. However, reasons and arguments are sometimes used by believers to defend and advance their positions. Arguments for the existence of God have been utilized in natural theology and theistic apologetics for at least two millennia. Three which have been prominent historically and still receive special attention in contemporary philosophy of religion discussions are the ontological, cosmological, and teleological arguments.

a. Ontological Arguments

First developed by Saint Anselm of Canterbury (1033–1109), ontological arguments take various forms. They are unique among traditional arguments for God’s existence in that they are a priori arguments, for they are based on premises that can allegedly be known independently of experience of the world. All of them begin with the concept of God and conclude that God must exist. If successful, ontological arguments prove that God’s non-existence is impossible.

Anselm argues that God is a being than which none greater can be conceived. It is one thing to exist in the mind (in the understanding) and another to exist outside the understanding (outside one’s thoughts; in reality). He then asks which is greater: to exist in the mind or in reality. His argument concludes this way:

Therefore, if that, than which nothing greater can be conceived, exists in the understanding alone, the very being, than which nothing greater can be con­ceived, is one, than which a greater can be conceived. But obviously this is impossible. Hence, there is no doubt that there exists a being, than which nothing greater can be conceived, and it exists both in the understanding and in reality. (Proslogion, chapter II, 54)

Since it would be a contradiction to affirm that the greatest possible being does not exist in reality but only in the mind (because existing in reality is greater than existing in the mind), one is logically drawn to the conclusion that God must exist.

There have been many objections to this argument. One of the most well-known is based on the analogy of the greatest possible island and was developed by Anselm’s fellow monk, Gaunilo. Utilizing a reductio ad absurdum, he argued that if we affirm Anselm’s conclusion, we must also affirm that the greatest possible island exists. Since that conclusion is absurd, so too is Anselm’s. Another important objection offered by Immanuel Kant was that existence is not a real predicate. Since existence does not add to the concept of a thing, and in Anselm’s argument existence is treated as a real predicate (rather than, say, as a quantifier), the argument is flawed.

Recent modal versions of the argument have been construed that avoid the objections to Anselm’s original formulation. Alvin Plantinga, for example, has devised a version of the ontological argument utilizing the semantics of modal logic: possibility, necessity, and possible worlds (a possible world being a world that is logically possible). Defining a maximally excellent being as one that is omniscient, omnipotent, and morally perfect in every possible world, his argument can be stated this way:

(1)   It is possible that a being exists which is maximally great (a being that we can call God).

(2)   So there is a possible world in which a maximally great being exists.

(3)   A maximally great being is necessarily maximally excellent in every possible world (by definition).

(4)   Since a maximally great being is necessarily maximally excellent in every possible world, that being is necessarily maximally excellent in the actual world.

(5)   Therefore, a maximally great being (for example, God) exists in the actual world.

Plantinga does not affirm that the argument provides conclusive proof that God exists, but he does claim that there is nothing irrational in accepting it.

Many objections have been raised against Plantinga’s modal ontological argument, including problems with possible worlds semantics, that God’s existence is a logical or metaphysical impossibility, and that it leads to metaphysical absurdities. Regarding the latter, Michael Martin (1932–), offers the following reductio:

(1’) It is possible that a special fairy exists.

(2’) So there is a possible world in which a special fairy exists.

(3’) A special fairy is necessarily a tiny woodland creature with magical powers in

every possible world (by definition).

(4’) Since a special fairy is necessarily a tiny woodland creature with magical powers

in every possible world, that fairy is necessarily a tiny woodland creature with

magical powers in the actual world.

(5’) Therefore, a special fairy exists in the actual world.

Martin then argues that premise (1’) is no more contrary to reason than premise (1), so if we affirm (1) and conclude that (5), we must also affirm (1’) and conclude that (5’). Given this argument structure, we could also conclude that ghosts, gremlins, and countless other mythical creatures exist as well, which is absurd.

b. Cosmological Arguments

Cosmological arguments begin by examining some empirical or metaphysical fact of the universe, from which it then follows that something outside the universe must have caused it to exist. There are different types of cosmological arguments, and its defenders include some of the most prominent thinkers spanning the history of philosophy, including Plato, Aristotle, ibn Sina, al-Ghazali, Maimonides, Aquinas, Descartes, and Leibniz. Three versions of the argument that have received much attention are the Thomistic contingency argument, the Leibnizian sufficient reason argument, and the kalam argument.

With the Thomistic contingency argument, named after the medieval Christian theologian/philosopher Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274), the claim is made that contingent things exist in the world—“contingent things” ostensibly referring to those entities which begin to exist and cease to exist and whose existence is dependent on another. It is next argued that not all things can be contingent, for if they were there would be nothing to ground their existence. Only a necessary thing (or being) can account for the existence of contingent things—“necessary thing” ostensibly referring to a thing which never began to exist and which cannot cease to exist and whose existence does not depend on another. This necessary thing (or being) is God.

Another type of cosmological argument is the Leibnizian sufficient reason argument, so named after the German thinker Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716). With this argument, an answer is sought to the question “Why is there something rather than nothing?” For Leibniz, there must be an explanation, or “sufficient reason,” for anything that exists, and the explanation for whatever exists must lie either in the necessity of its own nature or in a cause external to itself. The argument concludes that the explanation of the universe must lie in a transcendent God since the universe does not have within its own nature the necessity of existence and God does.

Some recent versions of the cosmological argument grant that contingent things exist due to the causal events of other contingent things, but they then go on to inquire why the universe should exist at all when conceivably this could have not been the case. Utilizing elements of both Aquinas’s and Leibniz’s arguments, the central point of these recent versions is that with respect to anything that exists, there is a reason for its existence. What provides a sufficient reason for the existence of the universe? It cannot be another contingent thing (and on into infinity), for to explain the existence of any contingent thing by another contingent thing lacks a sufficient reason why any contingent thing exists. Timothy O’Connor argues this way:

If our universe truly is contingent, the obtaining of certain fundamental facts or other will be unexplained within empirical theory, whatever the topological structure of contingent reality. An infinite regress of beings in or outside the spatiotemporal universe cannot forestall such a result. If there is to be an ultimate, or complete, explanation, it will have to ground in some way the most fundamental, contingent facts of the universe in a necessary being, something which has the reason for its existence within its own nature. It bears emphasis that such an unconditional explanation need not in any way compete with conditional, empirical explanations. Indeed, it is natural to suppose that empirical explanations will be subsumed within the larger structure of the complete explanation. (Theism and Ultimate Explanation: The Necessary Shape of Contingency. Oxford, Blackwell, 2008, 76)

An objection raised against both the Thomistic- and the Leibnizian-type arguments is that they are demanding explanations which are unwarranted. If for every individual contingent thing in the universe there is an explanation, why does the whole need a further explanation? Furthermore, an explanation must at some point come to an end—a brute fact. So why not end with the universe? Why posit some further transcendent reality?

Another form of cosmological argument is commonly referred to as the kalam argument (the term “kalam” is from medieval Islamic theology and came to mean “speculative theology”). The argument is structured by William Lane Craig, its most ardent proponent in recent times, as follows:


/                  \

beginning                        no beginning

/                   \

caused                       not caused

/           \

personal                 not personal

The dilemmas are obvious. Either the universe had a beginning or it did not. If it did, either that beginning was caused or it was not caused. If it was caused, either the cause was personal or it was impersonal. Based on these dilemmas, the argument can be put in the following logical form:

  1. Whatever begins to exist has a cause of its existence.
  2. The universe began to exist.
  3. Therefore, the universe has some kind of cause of its existence.
  4. The cause of the universe is either an impersonal cause or a personal one.
  5. The cause of the universe is not impersonal.
  6. Therefore, the cause of the universe is a personal one, which we call God.

This version of the cosmological argument was bolstered by work in astrophysics and cosmology in the late twentieth century. On one interpretation of the standard Big Bang cosmological model, the time-space universe sprang into existence ex nihilo approximately 13.7 billion years ago. Such a beginning is best explained, argue kalam defenders, by a non-temporal, non-spatial, personal, transcendent cause—namely God.

The claim that the universe began to exist is also argued philosophically in at least two ways. First, it is argued that an actual infinite set of events cannot exist, for actual infinities lead to metaphysical absurdities. Since an infinite temporal regress of events is an actual infinite set of events, such a regress is metaphysically impossible. So the past cannot be infinite; the universe must have had a temporal beginning. A second approach begins by arguing that an infinite series of events cannot be formed by successive addition (one member being added to another). The reason why is that, when adding finite numbers one after the other, the set of numbers will always be finite. The addition of yet another finite number, ad infinitum, will never lead to an actual infinite. Since the past is a series of temporal events formed by successive addition, the past could not be actually infinite in duration. Nor will the future be so. The universe must have had a beginning.

Many objections have been raised against the kalam argument, both scientific and philosophical, including that there are other cosmological models of the universe besides the Big Bang in which the universe is understood to be eternal, such as various multi-verse theories. Philosophical rebuttals marshaled against the kalam argument include the utilization of set theory and mathematical systems which employ actual infinite sets.

c. Teleological Arguments

Teleological arguments in the East go back as far as 100 C.E., where the Nyāya school in India argued for the existence of a deity based on the order found in nature. In the West, Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics offered arguments for a directing intelligence of the world given the order found within it. There is an assortment of teleological arguments, but a common theme among them is the claim that certain characteristics of the natural world reflect design, purpose, and intelligence. These features of the natural world are then used as evidence for an intelligent, intentional designer of the world.

The teleological argument has been articulated and defended at various times and places throughout history, but its zenith was in the early nineteenth century with perhaps its most ardent defender: William Paley (1743–1805). In his book, Natural Theology, Paley offers an argument from analogy: since we infer a designer of an artifact such as a watch, given its evident purpose, ordered structure, and complexity, so too we should infer a grand designer of the works of nature, since they are even greater in terms of their evident purpose, order, and complexity—what he describes as “means ordered to ends.” Paley’s argument can be structured this way:

  1. Artifacts (such as a watch), with their means to ends configurations, are the products of (human) design.
  2. The works of nature, such as the human hand, resemble artifacts.
  3. Thus the works of nature are probably the products of design.
  4. Furthermore, the works of nature are much more in number and far greater in complexity.
  5. Therefore, the works of nature were probably the products of a grand designer—one much more powerful and intelligent than a human designer.

A number of objections have been raised against Paley’s version of the design argument. Those offered by David Hume (1711–1776) in his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion are often taken to be archetype refutations of traditional design arguments. Among them are that the analogy between the works of nature and human artifacts is not particularly strong; that even if we could infer a grand designer of the universe, this designer turns out to be something less than the God of the theistic religions (especially given the great amount of evil in the world); and that just because a universe has the appearance of design, it does not follow that it is in fact designed; such an event could have occurred through natural, chance events.

A more recent version of the design argument is based on the apparent fine-tuning of the cosmos. Fine-tuning arguments, whose current leading defender is Robin Collins, include the claims that the laws of nature, the constants of physics, and the initial conditions of the universe are finely tuned for conscious life. Often cited as evidence are several dozen “cosmic constants” whose parameters are such that if they were altered even slightly, conscious life would be impossible. Consider the following three: (1) If the strong nuclear force (the force that binds protons and neutrons in an atom) had been either stronger or weaker by five percent, life would be impossible; (2) If neutrons were not roughly 1.001 times the mass of protons, all protons would have decayed into neutrons, or vice versa, and life would be impossible; (3) If gravity had been stronger or weaker by one part in 1040, life-sustaining stars, including the sun, could not exist; thus life would most likely be impossible. While each of the individual calculations of such constants may not be fully accurate, it is argued that the significant number of them, coupled with their independence from one other, provides evidence of their being intentionally established with conscious life in mind.

Objections to fine-tuning arguments are multifarious. According to an anthropic principle objection, if the laws of nature and physical constants would have varied to any significant degree, there would be no conscious observers such as ourselves. Given that such observers do exist, it should not be surprising that the laws and constants are just as they are. One way of accounting for such observers is the many-worlds hypothesis. In this view, there exist a large number of universes, perhaps an infinite number of them. Most of these universes include life-prohibiting parameters, but at least a minimal number of them would probably include life-permitting ones. It should not be surprising that one of them, ours, for example, is life-permitting. Much of the current fine-tuning discussion turns on the plausibility of the many-worlds hypothesis and the anthropic principle.

There are other versions of the teleological argument that have also been proposed which focus not on fundamental parameters of the cosmos but on different aspects of living organisms—including their emergence, alleged irreducibly complex systems within living organisms, information intrinsic within DNA, and the rise of consciousness—in an attempt to demonstrate intelligent, intentional qualities in the world. These biological and noölogical design arguments have not generally received as much attention as the fine-tuning argument by those engaged in natural theology or by the broader philosophical community.

Other arguments for the existence of God (or theism) include the moral argument, the argument from mind, the argument from religion experience, and Pascal’s wager. One common objection to the traditional arguments for God’s existence is that even if they are successful, they do not prove the existence of the deity of any particular religion. If successful, the cosmological argument only provides evidence for a transcendent first cause of the universe, nothing more; at best, the teleological argument provides evidence for a purposive, rational designer of the universe, nothing more; and so on. These conclusions are very different from the God (or gods) depicted in the Qur’an, or the Bible, or the Vedas.

Natural theologians maintain, however, that the central aim of these arguments is not to offer full-blown proofs of any particular deity, but rather to provide evidence or warrant for belief in a grand designer, or creator, or moral lawgiver. Some natural theologians argue that it is best to combine the various arguments in order to provide a cumulative case for a broad form of theism. Cosmological arguments provide insight into God’s creative providence; teleological arguments provide insight into God’s purposive nature and grand intelligence; and moral arguments provide insight into God’s moral nature and character. Taken together, these natural theologians argue, the classical arguments offer a picture of a deity not unlike the God of the theistic religious traditions and even if this approach does not prove the existence of any particular deity, it does nonetheless lend support to theism over naturalism (which, as used here, is the view that natural entities have only natural causes, and that the world is fully describable by the physical sciences).

Along with arguments for the existence of God, there are also a number of reasons one might have for denying the existence of God. One reason is that a person just does not find the arguments for God’s existence to be sufficiently compelling. If the burden is on the theist to provide highly convincing evidences or reasons that would warrant his or her believing that God exists, in the absence of such evidences and reasons disbelief is justified. Another reason one might have for not believing that God exists is that science conflicts with theistic beliefs and, given the great success of the scientific enterprise, it should have the last word on the matter. Since science has regularly rebuffed religious claims in the past, we should expect the claims of religion to eventually become extinct. A third possible reason for denying the existence of God is that the very concept of God is incoherent. And a fourth reason one might have is that the existence of God conflicts with various features of the natural world, such as evil, pain, and suffering.

d. The Challenge of Science

Over the last several hundred years there has been tremendous growth in scientific understanding of the world in such fields as biology, astronomy, physics, and geology. These advances have had considerable influence on religious belief. When religious texts, such as the Bible, have been in conflict with science, the latter has generally been the winner in the debate; religious beliefs have commonly given way to the power of the scientific method. For example, the three-tiered universe held by the biblical authors, with heaven above the sky, hell below the earth, and the sun moving around the earth (and with the sun stopping its rotation during battle at Joshua’s command), is no longer plausible given what we now know. It has seemed to some that modern science will be able to explain all of the fundamental questions of life with no remainder.

Given the advances of science and the retreat of religious beliefs, many in the latter half of the twentieth century agreed with the general Freudian view that a new era was on the horizon in which the infantile illusions, or perhaps delusions, of religion would soon go the way of the ancient Greek and Roman gods. With the onset of the twenty-first century, however, a new narrative has emerged. Religion has not fallen into oblivion, as many anticipated; in fact, religious belief is on the rise. Many factors account for this, including challenges to psychological and sociological theories which hold belief in God to be pathological or neurotic. In recent decades these theories have themselves been challenged by medical and psychological research, being understood by many to be theories designed primarily to destroy belief in God. Another important factor is the increase in the number of believing and outspoken scientists, such as Francis Collins, the director of the human genome project.

At the other end of the spectrum regarding religion, however, is a fairly small but vocal band of intellectual atheists who have spawned a movement dubbed the “New Atheism.” These atheists, whose leading voices include Richard Dawkins, Christopher Hitchens, Sam Harris, and Daniel Dennett, attempt to demonstrate that respect for belief in God is irrational and socially unacceptable. But despite this orchestrated opposition arguing the falsity and incoherence of theism, it has proved rather resilient. Indeed, the twenty-first century is reflecting a renewed interest in philosophical theism.

e. The Coherence of Theism

Philosophical challenges to theism have also included the claim that the very concept of God makes no sense—that the attributes ascribed to God are logically incoherent (either individually or collectively). There are first-rate philosophers today who argue that theism is coherent and others of equal stature who argue that theism is incoherent. Much of the criticism of the concept of theism has focused on God as understood in Judaism, Christianity, and Islam, but it is also relevant to the theistic elements found within Mahayana Buddhism, Hinduism, Confucianism, and certain forms of African and Native American religions. The question of whether theism is coherent is an important one, for if there is reason to believe that theism is incoherent, theistic belief is in an important sense undermined.

The logical consistency of each of the divine attributes of classical theism has been challenged by both adherents and non-adherents of theism. Consider the divine attribute of omniscience. If God knows what you will freely do tomorrow, then it is the case now that you will indeed do that tomorrow. But how can you be free not to do that thing tomorrow if it is true now that you will in fact freely do that thing tomorrow? There is a vast array of replies to this puzzle, but some philosophers conclude that omniscience is incompatible with future free action and that, since there is future free action, God—if God exists—is not omniscient.

Another objection to the coherence of theism has to do with the divine attribute of omnipotence and is referred to as the stone paradox. An omnipotent being, as traditionally understood, is a being who can bring about anything. So, an omnipotent being could create a stone that was too heavy for such a being to lift. But if he could not lift the stone, he would not be omnipotent, and if he could not make such a stone, he would not be omnipotent. Hence, no such being exists. A number of replies have been offered to this puzzle, but some philosophers conclude that the notion of omnipotence as traditionally defined is incoherent and must be redefined if the concept of God is to remain a plausible one.

Arguments for the incoherence of theism have been offered for each of the divine attributes. While there have been many challenges to the classical attributes of God, there are also contemporary philosophers and theologians who have defended each of them as traditionally understood. There is much lively discussion currently underway by those defending both the classical and neo-classical views of God. But not all theistic philosophers and theologians have believed that the truths of religious beliefs can be or even should be demonstrated or rationally justified. As mentioned above, fideists, such as Søren Kierkegaard (1813–1855), maintain that religious faith does not need rational justification or the support of rational arguments. For fideists, attempting to prove one’s religious faith may even be an indication of a lack of faith.

5. Problems of Evil and Suffering

a. Logical Problems

Perhaps the most compelling and noteworthy argument against theism is what is referred to as the problem of evil. Philosophers of the East and the West have long recognized that difficulties arise for one who affirms both the existence of an omnipotent and omnibenevolent God and the reality of evil. David Hume, quoting the ancient Greek thinker Epicurus (341–270 B.C.E.), got to the heart of the matter with the following pithy observation:

Is he [God] willing to prevent evil, but not able? then he is impotent. Is he able, but not willing? then he is malevolent. Is he both able and willing? whence then is evil? (Hume's Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Part X, 63)

There are different ways the problem of evil can be formulated. In fact, it is probably more accurate to refer to “problems” of evil. One formulation is construed as a logical problem. For the logical problem of evil, it is asserted that the two claims, (1) an omnipotent and omnibenevolent God exists, and (2) evil exists, are logically incompatible. Since evil ostensibly exists, the argument goes, God (understood traditionally as being omnipotent and omnibenevolent) must not exist.

In the latter half of the twentieth century, the logical argument held sway. But by the end of that century, it was widely acknowledged by philosophers of religion that the logical problem had been rebutted. One reason is that as claims (1) and (2) are not explicitly contradictory, there must be hidden premises or unstated assumptions which make them so. But what might those be? The assumed premises/assumptions appear to be something along these lines: (a) an omnipotent God could create any world, (b) an omnibenevolent God would prefer a world without evil over a world with evil, and (c) God would create the world he prefers. Given these claims, (1) and (2) would be logically incompatible. However, it turns out that at least (a) may not be true, even on a classical theistic account. It could be that a world with free agents is more valuable than a world with no free agents. Further, it could be that such free agents cannot be caused or determined to do only what is morally right and good, even by God. If this is so, in order for God to create agents who are capable of moral good, God had to create agents who are capable of moral evil as well. If this is a logical possibility, and it seems to be so, then premise (a) is not a necessary truth because God cannot create just any world.

In addition, premise (b) is not necessarily true either. For all we know, God could use evil to achieve some good end, such as bringing about the virtues of compassion and mercy. As long as (a) and (b) are possibly false, the conclusion of the argument is no longer necessarily true, so it loses its deductive force. This response to the logical argument from evil is called a defense, which is distinguished from a theodicy. The aim of a defense is to demonstrate that the arguments from evil are unsuccessful given a possible scenario or set of scenarios, whereas a theodicy is an attempt to justify God and the ways of God given the evil and suffering in the world. Both defenses and theodicies have been used by theists in responding to the various problems of evil.

b. Evidential Problems

Evidential arguments attempt to demonstrate that the existence of evil in the world counts as inductive evidence against the claim that God exists. One form of the evidential argument from evil is based on the assumption, often agreed on by theists and atheists alike, that an omnipotent, omniscient, omnibenevolent being would prevent the existence of significant amounts of gratuitous evil. Since significant amounts of gratuitous evil seem to exist, God probably does not. One influential approach, espoused by William Rowe (1931), contends that many evils, such as the slow and agonizing death of a fawn burned in a forest fire ignited by lightning, appear to be gratuitous. However, an omnipotent and omniscient being could have prevented them from occurring, and an omnibenevolent being would have not allowed any significant pointless evils to occur if they could have been avoided. So, the argument concludes, it is more reasonable to disbelieve that God exists.

One way of responding to such arguments is to attempt to demonstrate that there is, after all, a point to each of the seemingly gratuitous evils. A solid case for even some examples would lower the probability of the evidential argument, and one could maintain that normal epistemic limitations restrict knowledge in many other examples. The theistic traditions historically have, in fact, affirmed the inscrutability of God and the ways of God. It is from within this context that Stephen Wykstra developed a response to the evidential argument, a response that is referred to as “skeptical theism” (not to be taken as being skeptical about theism). The central point of skeptical theism is that because of human cognitive limitations we are unable to judge as improbable the claim that there are various goods secured by God’s allowing the evils in the world.

Rowe has provided responses to skeptical theism, one of which is that on this view one could never have any reason for doubting God’s existence given evil, no matter how horrific the evil turns out to be. The skeptical theist has created a chasm between human and divine knowledge far beyond what theism has traditionally affirmed.

Another version of the evidential argument has been advanced by Paul Draper. He argues that the world as it is, with its distribution of pains and pleasures, is more likely given what he calls a “hypothesis of indifference” than given theism. On this hypothesis, the existence of sentient beings (including their nature and their place) is neither the result of a benevolent nor a malevolent nonhuman person. Contrast this with the theistic account in which, since God is morally perfect, there must be morally good reasons for allowing biologically useless pain, and there must be morally good reasons for producing pleasures even if such pleasures are not biologically useful. But given our observations of the pains and pleasures experienced by sentient creatures, including their biologically gratuitous experiences (such as those brought about by biological evolution), the hypothesis of indifference provides a more reasonable account than theism.

In response, Peter van Inwagen (1942) maintains that this argument can be countered by contending that for all we know, in every possible world which exhibits a high degree of complexity (such as ours with sentient, intelligent life) the laws of nature are the same or have the same general features as the actual laws. We cannot assume, then, that the distribution of pain and pleasure (including the pains and pleasures reflected in biological evolution) in a world with a high degree of complexity such as ours would be any different given theism. We are simply not epistemically capable of accurately assigning a probability either way, so we cannot make the judgment that theism is less likely than the hypothesis of indifference.

When assessing arguments of this sort, some important questions for consideration are these: What is the claim probable or improbable with respect to? And what is the relevant background information with respect to the claim? The plausibility of the claim “God’s existence is improbable with respect to the evil in the world” considered alone may well be very different from the plausibility of the claim “God’s existence is improbable with respect to the evil in the world” when considered in conjunction with, say, one or more of the arguments for God’s existence. Furthermore, the theist can offer other hypotheses which may raise the probability of evil given God’s existence. For example, the major theistic traditions affirm the belief that God’s purposes are not restricted to this earthly life but extend on into an afterlife as well. In this case, there is further opportunity for God to bring moral good out of the many kinds and varieties of evil in this life. Thus the full scope of the considerations and evidences for and against theism may well raise the probability of God’s existence above that of taking into account only a part. Nevertheless, the evidential problem of evil remains a central argument type against the plausibility of theism.

c. Theodicy

A theodicy, unlike a defense, takes on the burden of attempting to vindicate God by providing a plausible explanation for evil. The theodical approach often takes the following general form: God, an omnipotent and omnibenevolent being, will prevent/eliminate evil unless there is a good reason or set of reasons for not doing so. There is evil in the world. Therefore God must have a good reason or set of reasons for not preventing/eliminating evil. There are various attempts to demonstrate what that good reason is, or those good reasons are. Two important theodicies are those that appeal to the significance and value of free will, and those that appeal to the significance and value of acquiring virtuous traits of character in the midst of suffering.

The first fully developed theodicy was crafted by Augustine in the fifth century of the common era. For Augustine, God is perfect in goodness, and the universe, God’s creation, is also good and exists for a good purpose. Since all creation is intrinsically good, evil must not represent the positive existence of any substantial thing. Evil, then, turns out to be a metaphysical privation, a privatio boni (privation of goodness), or the going wrong of something that is inherently good.

Both moral and natural evil, for Augustine, entered the universe through the wrongful use of free will. Since all creatures, both angels and humans, are finite and mutable, they have the capacity to choose evil, which they have done. Thus, while God created everything in the world good, including angels and humans, through the use of their wills these free agents have ushered into the world that which is contrary to the good. Much of what is good has become corrupted, and this corruption stems from these free creatures, not from God. The Augustinian theodicy concludes with the culmination of history entailing cosmic justice. For God will, in the eschaton (the end of time), usher all who repent into the eternal bliss of heaven and castigate to hell all those who, through their free will, have rejected God’s gift of salvation.

One objection to Augustine’s theodicy is that a number of evils are brought about by natural events, such as disease and natural disasters, including earthquakes and tsunamis. These evils do not seem to occur because of the free choices of moral creatures. The free will theodicy, then, is ineffectual as a solution to arguments from evil that include natural events such as these. C. S. Lewis, Alvin Plantinga, and others have proposed that supernatural beings may ultimately be responsible for evils of this kind, but most theodicists are skeptical of such a notion.

Another objection to this theodicy is that it was crafted in a pre-scientific culture and thus is devoid of an evolutionary view of the development of flora and fauna, including such elements as predation and species annihilation. The narrative of an originally perfect creation through which evil entered by the choices of free agents is now generally considered to be mistaken and unhelpful.

The soul-making (or person-making) theodicy was developed by John Hick, utilizing ideas from the early Christian thinker and bishop Irenaeus (c.130–c.202 C.E.). According to this theodicy, as advanced by Hick, God created the world as a good place, but no paradise, for developing morally and spiritually mature beings. Through evolutionary means, God is bringing about such individuals who have the freedom of will and the capacity to mature in love and goodness. Individuals placed in this challenging environment of our world, one in which there is epistemic distance between God and human persons, have the opportunity to choose, through their own free responses, what is right and good and thus develop into the mature persons that God desires them to be—exhibiting the virtues of patience, courage, generosity, and so on.

Evil, then, is the result of both the creation of a soul-making environment and of the human choices to act against what is right and good. While there is much evil in the world, nevertheless the trajectory of the world is toward the good, and God will continue to work with human (and perhaps other) persons, even in the afterlife if necessary, such that in the eschaton everyone will finally be brought to a place of moral and spiritual maturity.

One objection to the soul-making theodicy is that there are many evils in the world that seem to have nothing to do with character development. Gratuitous evils appear to be in abundance. Furthermore, there is no empirical support for the claim that the world is structured for soul making. Many persons appear to make no moral progress after much suffering; in fact, some persons seem to be worse off by the end of their earthly life.

In reply, it can be argued that apparently pointless evils are not always, in fact, without purpose and merit. The compassion that is evoked from such seemingly indiscriminate and unfair miseries, for example, is a great good, and one which may not arise without the miseries appearing as unfair and indiscriminate. While God did not intend or need any particular evils for soul-making purposes, God did arguably need to create an environment where such evils were a possibility. Thus, while each individual instance of evil may not be justified by a particular greater good, the existence of a world where evil is possible is necessary for a world where soul making can occur. Furthermore, with this theodicy a positive doctrine of life after death is central, for there are cases in which difficulties in an individual’s life breed bitterness, anger, and even a reduction of virtuous character. So in these instances, at least, the soul-making process would need to continue on in the afterlife.

The free will and soul-making theodicies share a common supposition that God would not permit evil which is not necessary for a greater good. But many theists maintain that some evils are not justified, that some horrors are so damaging that there are no goods which outweigh them. But if there are such evils, the question can be raised why God would allow them. It may be that standard theism, theism unaccompanied by other religious claims, is inadequate to provide a response. In fact, some have argued that an adequate reply requires an expanded theism which incorporates other particular religious claims.

One such approach has been offered by Marilyn McCord Adams (1943–). Utilizing the resources of her own religious tradition, Adams pushes theodicy beyond a general theism to an expanded Christian theism utilizing a Christocentric theological framework. She focuses on the worst sorts of evils, which she calls “horrendous evils.” These are evils which, when experienced by a particular person, give that person reason to doubt whether her life could, considered in totality, be taken to be a great good to her. Adams argues that the Christian theodicist should abandon the widely held assumption that responses to evil can only include those goods that both theists and atheists acknowledge. She maintains that goods of this sort are finite and temporal, whereas the Christian has infinite and eternal goods at her disposal. An intimate, loving, eternal relationship with God, for example, may well be a good that is infinite and incomparable with any other kind of good. She further argues that taking a “general reasons-why” approach to theodicy in which some general reason is provided to cover all forms of evil does not seem to be the kind of help we need. As a Christian philosopher, she believes a more adequate response can be provided which involves the coexistence of God and the evils in the world. Rather than focusing on the possible reasons why God might allow evils of this sort, she maintains that it is enough to show how God can be good and yet permit their existence.

Adams argues that there is good reason for the Christian to believe that all evils will ultimately be defeated in one’s life and that God will ultimately engulf all personal horrors through integrating participation in the evils into one’s life with God. Given this integration, she argues, all human beings, even those who have experienced the most horrific evils on earth, will in the eschaton be redeemed and thus find ultimate meaning and goodness in their lives. Such a view does, of course, presuppose one particular religious tradition and one interpretation of that tradition.

Another recent approach to the problem of evil has been offered by Eleonore Stump. She considers the problem to be not an intellectual one attempting to solve a logical puzzle, but rather a deeply personal one involving interpersonal relations, the central relations of which are between God and God’s creatures. She treats the problem of evil as centrally a problem of suffering and utilizes an account of second-person experiences and second-person biblical narratives to make her case.

Stump suggests a possible world, one grounded in the worldview of Thomas Aquinas, in which love is central. The proper object of love is God, which, on Aquinas’s doctrine of divine simplicity, is identical to God’s goodness. This goodness is also within human beings, and so a proper object of love includes love of other human beings (as well as oneself). Fallen human beings prefer pleasure and power over the greater goods, and as such human beings are not properly internally integrated around the ultimate and proper good. One must be redeemed in order to have proper internal integration.

Using the biblical story of Job, Stump sees several levels of second-person accounts, including God’s interactions with Job and a dialogue between God and Satan. Job, she suggests, received what he needed: an assurance of God’s goodness. But the way Job received this assurance, the way he knows that his suffering is under the providence of a good and loving God, occurs through a second-person experience that is difficult to explain to one who did not have the same experience. What we have in these accounts, then, are second-person stories relating God’s personal interaction with his creatures. What we learn from such biblical stories is that God will produce goods from one’s suffering for the one suffering—goods which would otherwise have not been produced.

One objection to Stump’s defense is that, in many cases, suffering seems to produce no growth or goods in the individual who is suffering. In fact, in some cases, suffering seems to predictably diminish the sufferer. Furthermore, much evil and suffering seems to be indiscriminate and gratuitous.

d. The Hiddenness of God

A related problem is that of divine hiddenness. Many people are perplexed and see as problematic that, if God exists, God does not make his existence sufficiently clear and available. The problem, concisely stated, can be put this way. If God exists as the perfect, loving, omnibenevolent being that theists have generally taken God to be, then God would desire the best for his creatures. The best for God’s creatures, at least in the Christian religion and to some extent in all of the Abrahamic traditions, is to be in relationship with God. However, many people, both non-theists and sometimes theists themselves, claim to have no awareness of God. Why would God remain hidden and elusive, especially when individuals would benefit from being aware of God?

John Schellenberg has argued that the hiddenness of God provides evidence that God does not in fact exist. Using a child-parent analogy, an analogy which is often used in the Abrahamic traditions themselves, Schellenberg notes that good parents are present to their children, especially when they are in need. But God is nowhere to be found, whether one is in need or not. So God, at least as traditionally understood, must not exist.

Schellenberg offers several different forms of the argument. One version can be sketched this way. If God does exist, then reasonable nonbelief would not occur, for surely a perfectly loving God would desire that people believe in God. And if God desires that people so believe, God would work it out so that persons would be in a reasonable position to believe. However, reasonable nonbelief does occur. There are persons who do not believe in God, and they are reasonable in doing so. Even after studying the evidence, examining their motives of belief, praying and seeking God, they still do not believe and see no good reason to believe. But a perfectly loving and good God, it seems, would ensure belief in God by all such persons. God would make himself known to them so that they would believe. Since there is reasonable nonbelief, then, we have solid evidence that God, as a perfectly loving, caring being does, not exist. The argument can be stated concisely this way:

  1. If there is a God, he is perfectly loving.
  2. If a perfectly loving God exists, reasonable nonbelief does not occur.
  3. Reasonable nonbelief occurs.
  4. So no perfectly loving God exists (from 2 and 3).

Various replies can be made to this argument. While not a common move by theists, one could deny the first premise. Dystheists maintain that God is less (maybe much less) than omnibenevolent. This view of God is certainly not consistent with traditional theism whereby, as Anselm put it, God is “that than which nothing greater can be conceived.”

Another reply is to deny premise two, and several reasons might be offered in support of its denial. First, it may be that those persons who do not believe are, for one reason or another, not ready to believe that God exists, perhaps because of emotional or psychological or other reasons. So God hides out of love and concern for the person. Second, it could be that God’s revealing himself to some people would produce the wrong kind of belief or knowledge of God or could cause one to believe for the wrong reasons, perhaps out of fear or trepidation or an egoistic desire for success. In cases like this, God’s hiding would, again, be due to God’s love and concern for those who are not yet ready to believe.

A third reply is to deny the third premise. Some theists have, in fact, maintained that any nonbelief of God is unreasonable—that every case of nonbelief is one in which the person is epistemically and morally culpable for her nonbelief. That is, while such persons do not believe that God exists, they should so believe. They have the requisite evidence to warrant such belief, yet they deny or suppress it; they are intentionally disbelieving.

For many philosophers of religion, these replies to the issue of divine hiddenness are unsatisfactory. The elusiveness of God continues to be a problem for both theists and non-theists.

e. Karma and Reincarnation

Non-theistic religions have also offered accounts of evil, including its nature and existence, specifically with respect to suffering. For Hindus and Buddhists, these considerations are rooted in karma and rebirth. In its popular formulations, rebirth is the view that the conscious self transmigrates from one physical body to the next after death. Each human being has lived former lives, perhaps as another human being or maybe even as another kind of organism. Rebirth is connected to the doctrine of karma. As typically understood within Hinduism and Buddhism, karma literally means “deed” or “action”—what one does. It can also mean one’s intention or motivation for a given action, or what happens to an individual. Its broader meaning, sometimes referred to as the “law of karma,” is a law of moral causation, including the results of one’s actions. Understood this way, it involves causal connections linking what an individual does to what happens to them. It is, in effect, the idea that one reaps the good and bad consequences of her or his actions, either in this life or in another life.

Reincarnation and karma seem to offer a better account of evil and suffering than does theism. For example, it seems exceedingly unfair that one child is born healthy into a wealthy, loving family, whereas another child is born sickly into a poor, cruel environment. If there is a personal, creator God who brought these two persons into the world, God seems to be unloving and unjust. But if the two children are reaping the consequences of actions they performed in previous lives, this seems to provide a justification for the inequalities. The effect of one’s karma determines the circumstances of one’s past, present, and future lives. We reap what we sow.

Various objections have also been raised against karma/rebirth. According to the karmic law of cause and effect, a person’s present life circumstances are explained by her actions in a previous life; and her life circumstances in that life are explained by her life circumstances in a life previous to that one; and so on indefinitely. So the solution hoped for regarding inequalities never seems to come to an end. Furthermore, does it really seem fair that when a person who has lived a long life dies and is reincarnated, she must start all over again as a baby with her maturity, life experiences, wisdom, and memories completely erased?

Another difficulty for the karma/rebirth solution has to do with free will. An initial advantage of this solution to the problem of evil is that real moral agency is preserved. In fact, moral agency is central to the karma/rebirth solution: our moral decisions self-determine our future experiences, making us responsible for our own destiny. Upon further reflection, the view seems to run contrary to free moral agency. Consider the example of a man contemplating the rape and murder of a woman. Suppose he has done so before, and has thus far not been caught. He is considering redirecting his life by turning himself in to the authorities and receiving the consequences of his actions. But just as he is pondering this option, a woman strolls by and his mad passions for rape and murder begin to burn within him. He now has the choice to continue down the path of destruction or put a stop to it. If he decides to attack the woman and does so, then on the karmic account the woman was not completely innocent after all; she is paying the price for her former evil actions. In that case, the rapist is not truly free to act as he does, for he is simply following mechanistically the effects of karmic justice. He is merely the instrumental means for meting out the justice requisite for this woman’s previous moral failings. If, however, the woman does not deserve such moral recompense, then karmic justice will ensure that she does not receive it. In that case, the rapist will be unable to engage in the attack.

The problem that arises has to do with locating the moral freedom in this system. If the rapist is deterministically carrying out justice on his victim, then it seems that he is not truly a free moral agent after all. He is simply a cog in the karmic justice machine. It is disconcerting to affirm a moral system in which we understand raped and murdered victims to be themselves morally culpable for such acts of brutality against them. On the other hand, suppose the rapist really is free to attack the woman. If she was not deserving of such an act, this would be a serious violation of the law of karma whereby suffering occurs only because of one’s previous evil actions. If in attempting to justify such actions, the defender of the karmic system replied that the woman would in a future life receive a reward for such a morally gratuitous act, this does not appear to be consistent with karma, for this would run counter to the central principle of karma in which evil and suffering are the effects of one’s previous deeds.

As with theistic replies to evil, karmic solutions may be helpful at some level, but they nevertheless leave one with less than complete answers to the variety of problems of evil and suffering.

6. Miracles

The term “miracle” (Latin mirari, to wonder) is generally used in religious contexts to refer to an unusual event which is not explicable by natural causes alone but rather is the result of divine activity. Theists commonly consider most of the events that occur in the world to be, fundamentally, acts of God. As creator and sustainer of the universe, God is, broadly construed, the ultimate cause of what occurs in the universe. But many theists also affirm that some events involve a direct act of God, such as “miraculous” healings or in the case of Christian theism, the resurrection of Jesus, or in the case of Islam, the production of the Qur’an.

But there is debate among philosophers of religion about what kinds of divine activity should be considered miraculous. David Hume maintained that a miracle is a “violation of the laws of nature.” As such, he raised objections to such a notion. One objection is that it is never reasonable to believe a report that a violation of a law of nature has occurred. The evidence used to support a claim of a miraculous event is the testimony of witnesses. But the establishment of a natural law was based on the uniform experience of many persons over time. So the witness testimony necessary to establish a miracle would need to be greater than that which established the natural law in the first place. Since this never happens, no evidence is sufficient to make probable or establish the occurrence of a violation of a natural law, so it is always unreasonable to believe that such a violation has occurred.

Objections have been raised to Hume’s definition of a miracle. One objection is that miracles are not in fact violations of natural laws. Natural laws are descriptive rather than prescriptive; they describe what will, or likely will, occur or not occur under certain specifiable conditions. In that case, referring to God’s occasional actions in the world as a violation of them would be misrepresentative. If what one means by a violation of the laws of nature is just an exception to usual processes in the natural world, however, this objection is unwarranted.

This leads back to the issue of whether it is ever reasonable to believe that an exception to the usual processes in the natural world has occurred, and also whether it can be established that God has directly acted in the world. Hume does not attempt to demonstrate that miracles are a metaphysical impossibility. His approach is an epistemic one: to show that there is never sufficient evidence to warrant belief in a miracle.

One response to Hume’s claim about the insufficiency of evidence for belief in miracles is that his understanding of probability is inadequate. Determining the probability of an event is a rather complex undertaking, and simply utilizing the frequency of an occurrence to determine its probability, as Hume apparently does, simply will not do. Establishing the a priori probability of a miracle without the background information of, for example, the existence of God, the nature of God, the purposes and plans of God, and so on, is impossible. If one had such knowledge, a particular miracle may turn out to be highly probable.

Recent discussions of miracles by philosophers of religion have often focused on the concept of natural law, probability theory, and the role of religion as evidence for a particular religion or for belief in God.

7. Conclusion

Philosophy of religion is a flourishing field. Beyond those specific areas described above, there are also a number of important currents emerging, including feminist and continental approaches, renewed interest in medieval philosophy of religion, and an emphasis on the environment, race and ethnicity, and science and faith.

8. References and Further Reading

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  • Anderson, Pamela Sue. “What’s Wrong with the God’s Eye Point of View: A Constructive Feminist Critique of the Ideal Observer Theory.” In Faith and Philosophical Analysis: The Impact of Analytical Philosophy on the Philosophy of Religion, Harriet Harris and C. J. Insole, eds. Aldershot: Ashgate, 2005.
  • Anselm of Canterbury. St. Anselm: Basic Writings. LaSalle, IL: Open Court Publishing, [1077–1078] 1962.
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  • Bergmann, Michael. “Skeptical Theism and Rowe’s New Evidential Argument from Evil.” Noûs 35 (2001) 2:278–296.
  • Bergmann, Michael and Michael Rea. “In Defense of Skeptical Theism: A Reply to Almeida and Oppy.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 83 (2005): 241–251.
  • Bowker, John. Problems of Suffering in Religions of the World. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1970.
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  • Caputo, John. The Religious: Blackwell Readings in Continental Philosophy. Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2001.
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  • Clayton, John. Religions, Reasons and Gods: Essays in Cross-Cultural Philosophy of Religion. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.
  • Coakley, Sarah. Powers and Submissions: Spirituality, Philosophy, and Gender. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2002.
  • Collins, Robin. “The Teleological Argument.” In Paul Copan and Chad Meister, eds., Philosophy of Religion: Classic and Contemporary Issues. Oxford: Blackwell, 2008, 98–111.
  • Collins, Robin. “The Teleological Argument: An Exploration of the Fine Tuning of the Universe.” In William Lane Craig and J. P. Moreland, eds. The Blackwell
  • Companion to Natural Theology. Oxford: Blackwell, 2009.
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  • Copan, Paul. Loving Wisdom: Christian Philosophy of Religion. St. Louis: Chalice Press, 2007.
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  • Craig, W. The Kalam Cosmological Argument. New York: Barnes and Noble, 1979.
  • Craig, William Lane. The Cosmological Argument from Plato to Leibniz. Eugene, OR: Wipf and Stock, 1980.
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  • Hick, John. An Interpretation of Religion: Human Responses to the Transcendent. 2nd ed. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2004.
  • Hick, John. Evil and the God of Love. New edition. London: Palgrave Macmillan, 2007.
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel. The Evidential Argument from Evil. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1996.
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel Paul Moser, ed. Divine Hiddenness. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Hume, David. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. Second edition. Richard H. Popkin, ed. Indianapolis/Cambridge: Hackett Publishing, 1998.
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  • Meister, Chad. Introducing Philosophy of Religion. London: Routledge, 2009.
  • Meister, Chad and Paul Copan, eds. The Routledge Companion to Philosophy of Religion. London: Routledge, 2007; second edition 2012.
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  • Moser, Paul. The Evidence for God: Religious Knowledge Reexamined. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
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  • O’Connor, Timothy. Theism and Ultimate Explanation: The Necessary Shape of Contingency. Oxford, Blackwell, 2008.
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  • Peterson, Michael, William Hasker, Bruce Reichenbach, and David Basinger. Introduction to the Philosophy of Religion. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991.
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  • Plantinga, Alvin. Does God Have a Nature? Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press, 1980.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warrant: The Current Debate. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warrant and Proper Function. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warranted Christian Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Plantinga, Alvin and Michael Tooley. Knowledge of God. Oxford: Blackwell, 2008.
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Author Information

Chad Meister
Bethel College (Indiana)
U. S. A.

Immanuel Kant: Radical Evil

kant2 The subject of Immanuel Kant’s philosophy of religion has received more attention in the beginning of the 21st century than it did in Kant’s own time. Religion was an unavoidable topic for Kant since it addresses the ultimate questions of metaphysics and morality. For, as he presents it in his Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals and elsewhere, the universal moral law does not entirely depend upon demonstrating the existence of God, but rather upon reason (though he believes that its source cannot be divorced from the concept of God). Nevertheless he shocks the casual reader of the First Preface of his Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (hereafter Religion) by claiming that morality “inevitably leads to religion.”

Obedience to the moral law, of which Kant believes religion should be an example, appears to be an expectation that is neither universally nor willingly practiced. What is notable about the first two chapters of Religion is that he addresses this phenomenon in a manner that his Enlightenment predecessors had not: The failure of human moral agents to observe the moral law is symptomatic of a character or disposition (Gesinnung) that has been corrupted by an innate propensity to evil, which is to subordinate the moral law to self-conceit. Because this propensity corrupts an agent’s character as a whole, and is the innate “source” of every other evil deed, it may be considered “radical.” However, this propensity can be overcome through a single and unalterable “revolution” in the mode of thought (Revolution für die Denkungsart), which is simultaneously the basis for a gradual reform of character in the mode of sense (für die Sinnesart); for without the former, there is no basis for the latter. This reformation of character ultimately serves as the ground for moral agents within an ethical commonwealth, which, when understood eschatologically, is the Kingdom of God on Earth.

Kant’s account of radical evil demonstrates how evil can be a genuine moral alternative while nevertheless being an innate condition. Given the general optimism of the time, Kant’s view was revolutionary. It not only harkened back to an older Augustinian account of human nature, but also affirmed a propensity to evil within human nature using his apparatus of practical reason.

Table of Contents

  1. Kant on the Natural Predisposition to Good and the Propensity to Evil
  2. The Propensity to Evil: Universal and Innate
  3. The Source of the Propensity to Radical Evil: Two Views
  4. Overcoming Evil: The Necessity of an Ethical-Religious Revolution
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary References
      1. German
      2. English
    2. Secondary References

1. Kant on the Natural Predisposition to Good and the Propensity to Evil

Kant’s account of radical evil in Religion must be seen within the context of his account of why, given the force of the moral law, rational beings would actually choose evil. The presence of moral evil in human beings can be explained by their possession of an innate propensity to subordinate the moral law to inclination. Of course, for Kant to even suggest that human beings have such a propensity places him at odds with the Enlightenment Zeitgeist, which saw human beings as neither wholly good nor wholly evil, but somewhere in between (“latitudinarianism”). He ultimately rejected this and in his Religion, he not only shows that a universal propensity to radical evil is possible, but also gives an account of how it is possible.

Contrary to the latitudinarianism of Jean-Jacques Rousseau and others on the subject of human nature, Kant holds to the following rigoristic thesis: Ethically, human beings are either wholly evil or wholly good by virtue of whether or not an agent has adopted the moral law as the governing maxim for all of his or her maxims (Religion 6:22-23). For either the moral law is the governing maxim for the choice of maxims or it is not; making the moral law the ground of our maxims is sufficient for moral goodness. This thesis turns on a second thesis: An individual with a morally good character or disposition (Gessinnung) has adopted a moral maxim as a governing maxim, and incorporates the moral law as a basis for choosing all other maxims. If an agent has done so, then by virtue of making all other maxims compliant with this maxim, these subsequent maxims will be consistent with the moral law. Nevertheless, when an alternative maxim—that of self-conceit—is chosen as a governing maxim, then this egoistic alternative becomes the basis for maxim choice and the moral law is subordinated to an alternative governing maxim along with every other maxim.

Consequently, the ethical choice facing the moral agent is either to subordinate all other maxims to the moral law, or to subordinate the moral law with every other maxim to an egoistic alternative. The fact is that human agents, although conscious of the moral law, nevertheless do in fact incorporate the occasional deviation from it as part of their individual maxim set. When an agent mis-subordinates the requirements of morality to the incentives of self-conceit (however small it may be), the result is radical evil (Religion 6.32).

Note that this propensity does not amount to the rejection of morality. It is in fact perfectly compatible with our acceptance of the requirements of the moral law, but only insofar as they are compatible with a maxim of inclination. But the next question, as always with Kant, must be one of possibility: how is it that radical evil is even possible for human agents?

Every human being possesses the incentive to adopt the moral law as the governing maxim for maxim choice by virtue of it having arisen out of a basic predisposition to the good. As such, an individual’s predisposition constitutes the determinate nature (Bestimmung) of a human being as a whole, of which Kant identifies three basic predispositions (Anlagen): animality (Thierheit), personality (Persönlichkeit), and humanity (Menschlichheit). They belong to us as part of our motivational DNA. By itself, a predisposition is generally not a conscious choice, but a source of motivation for choices, some of which happen to have ethical significance. The basic predispositions, taken as a whole, are considered good in the sense that, not only do they not resist the moral law, but they also demand compliance with it  (Religion 6:28). For a human agent to have an original predisposition to the good yet nevertheless to be capable of evil, suggests that the possibility for the corruption of human nature is a consequence of the corruption of one of our basic predispositions.

Although it would be tempting to do so, it would be a mistake to identify the source of this corruption in our sensuous animal nature (the predisposition to animality). This predisposition concerns itself with the purely instinctual elements of the human being qua mammal: self-preservation, the sexual drive, and the desire for community. While the inclinations of animality indeed influence us ignobly, they are nevertheless necessary for every member of the species to survive and flourish. Hence human sensuality and appetite alone could hardly make human beings radically evil. As Kant states (Religion 6:35): “For not only do [the natural inclinations] bear no direct relation to evil . . . we also cannot presume ourselves responsible for their existence (we cannot because as connatural to us, natural inclinations do not have us for their author).”

Yet neither can our predisposition to personality be identified with our moral corruption, since Kant attributes to personality the capacity not only to grasp but also to determine the maxims that are morally required of us as universal legislation. For unlike the predisposition to animality, the predisposition to personality shares, with humanity, the property of rationality. The incentive to follow the moral law thus requires a distinct predisposition, so that the moral law can be an incentive given “from within” that stands in contrast to a circumstantially dependent happiness. It is the “highest incentive” (Religion 6:26n) by which we both grasp and choose the moral law, and it provides the basis for our personhood, if not our accountability. For this reason radical evil cannot constitute a “corruption of the morally legislative reason” (Religion 6:35).

This leaves humanity as the remaining basic predisposition susceptible to corruption. Although it shares the property of rationality with the predisposition to personality, humanity is distinct by virtue of the fact that it is concerned with the practical and therefore calculative elements of life. Yet this basic predisposition also possesses the inclination to seek equality in the eyes of others and to determine whether or not one is happy by comparison with others (Religion 6:26-27). It is manifestly egocentric since it relates to others in terms of its concern for happiness. Yet it is not by itself evil. Rather, it is from these positive characteristics within our predisposition of humanity that evil becomes a possibility and constitutes a propensity to egoistic and malignant self-love as self-conceit.

2. The Propensity to Evil: Universal and Innate

Once Kant is able to show how radical evil, as an innate condition, is possible the question becomes: How can evil, insofar as it rests on a propensity, constitute a genuine choice? In many ways, this question appears to be the essential problem for Kant’s ethics, since he believes that rational moral agency entails not only the capacity to know but also to obey the moral law.

Generally speaking, a propensity (Hang) is an innate yet non-necessary feature of every person that serves as a motivation for action in distinctively human affairs.  However, unlike a basic predisposition (e.g., humanity, animality, and personality), a propensity can be represented as having been acquired by habit if it is good, or if it is evil, as having been self-inflicted (Religion 6:29). It demonstrates a tendency to respond or act in a particular manner, either in accordance with, or in tension with the moral law. Taken together, both predispositions and propensities serve to form an individual’s mindset or character (Gessinnung), for the development of which every human being is responsible.

The obvious requirement for Kant at this stage is to give an account of the nature of the propensity to evil, which he provides in psychological terms as a disordering of incentives. As opposed to other vices, this propensity is essentially depravity, and stands in contrast to frailty (fragilitas) and moral impurity (impuritas, improbitas). Depravity or perversity (perversitas), unlike frailty, is not mere weakness and an inability to resist sensuous inclination (Religion 6:29). And unlike impurity, it is more than merely obeying the moral law from alternative motivations (instead of a sense of duty). Instead, depravity must be understood as the reversal of “the ethical order as regards the incentives of a free power of choice” (Religion 6:30). The propensity to evil becomes manifest when human beings choose to act (Willkür) in accordance with the incentive of self-conceit, which stands in opposition to the incentive of the moral law. (Religion 6:36).

Yet merely possessing the propensity to self-conceit does not by itself make an agent evil, since a moral agent already possesses both the incentive of the moral law and that of self-conceit within that agent’s hierarchy of maxims. An agent’s moral character as a whole is determined ultimately by which maxim is going to be the dominant maxim for the choice of maxims. Yet, because both cannot fulfill this role, they compete with each other with the result that one is inevitably “subordinated to the other” (Religion 6:36).  An evil character results when the moral agent makes the satisfaction of the moral law as the basis for maxim choice (Willkür) conditional to the incentives of self love (understood as self-conceit) and their inclinations (Religion 6:36). And so, what makes for an evil character is deviating from the moral law as the basis for maxim choice and adopting self-conceit in its place (Religion 6:29).

Note that for Kant, the faculty of volition or desire, or freedom of the will (Wille), has two different senses, a broad sense and a narrow sense. In the narrow sense (as Wille) it refers to the practical will that formulates laws as the “faculty of desire whose inner determining ground, hence even what pleases it, lies within the subject’s [practical] reason.” Practical will is considered in relation to the ground determining the choice of action (Metaphysics of Morals, 6:213), and through it an agent formulates both hypothetical and categorical imperatives. Practical will stands in contrast with executive will (Willkür), which is the power of choice (together with which it forms the will in the broad sense) to choose, decide, wish, and formulate maxims presented to it by the practical will as imperatives. Hence, whether or not an agent is wholly good or evil is determined entirely by “a free power of choice (Willkür) and this power . . .  on the basis of its maxims [which] must reside in the subjective ground of the possibility of the deviation of the maxims from the moral law” (Religion 6:29).

Thus, either the incentive of the moral law or the incentive of egoistic self-conceit is sufficient for the agent to be either morally good or morally evil. When the propensity to subordinate the moral law to the governing maxim of self-conceit is taken up within the mindset or disposition (Gesinnung) as a governing maxim, the agent’s character as a whole is corrupted and becomes radically evil.

3. The Source of the Propensity to Radical Evil: Two Views

The propensity to evil is affirmed by Kant as a universal yet non-necessary feature of every human being. However, he appears to believe that its universal quality entails that there is no need for proof of its innateness. As he states: “We can spare ourselves the formal proof that there must be such a corrupt propensity rooted in the human being, in view of the multitude of woeful examples that the experience of human deeds parades before us” (Religion 6:33). Such examples are obvious simply from an examination of history and anthropology (Religion 6:33-34). The fact that Kant raises the possibility of a formal proof for the innateness of this propensity while declining to give one raises the question: What is the basis for characterizing this propensity as innate?

One view is that radical evil may be cast in terms of what Kant has identified as “unsociable sociality” (ungesellige Geselligkeit; “The Idea for a Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View” 8:20). It arises within the human agent from interactions within society, and its demonstration need not appeal to a litany of human evils from which to derive an inductive proof. Instead, all that is necessary is an examination of the predisposition to humanity. Recall that by virtue of this predisposition, we possess a natural tendency not only to compare ourselves with others, but to compete with each other as a means of deriving our own self-worth. From our social interactions, we learn to give preference to our own concerns and needs, or self-conceit (Religion 6:26-27). This unsociable sociality becomes manifest in our tendency to exempt ourselves from the moral law while expecting others to follow it, treating others as means to our ends rather than as ends.  And so, in human competitiveness we seek to compare and gain mastery over others, making our own preferences the basis for our governing maxim.

The source of this feature of the basic predisposition to humanity manifests itself in natural and self-aggrandizing human competitiveness. It originates out of the company of other human beings who mutually corrupt one another’s moral predispositions (Religion 6:93-94). Hence, by virtue of living in community and in our need for sociality, the shortcomings of our basic predisposition to humanity accounts for our self-conceit. Our social interactions serve as a kind of breeding ground for radical evil.

Our natural tendencies not only to compare ourselves with others, but to compete with them as a means for deriving our own self-worth, can be demonstrated through the study of anthropology. However this interpretation does not entail that Kant thinks that the individual is absolved of responsibility. Evil remains a deed that is the product of an individual’s capacity for choice, and for this reason the individual still retains the responsibility for its commission. Even if we claim that we are not guilty of a particular social evil (e.g., slavery or the Holocaust), on account of having been caught up in the “spirit of the age,” then inasmuch as we are participants, we are still guilty.

Thus on this first view, the propensity to evil is simply part of our nature as social beings and is aggravated by our proximity to each other, the existence of which is evident from an observation of unsociable sociability when, and where it occurs  in human society. It is a universal feature shared by every human being, yet it does not require holding that each individual necessarily possesses this feature.

The alternative view for the basis for the propensity’s innateness is that the subordination of the moral law to the incentive of self-conceit is an entirely timeless and intelligible “deed” (That). This wholly intelligible act is so called because it does not take place at any one point in time, but it is nevertheless the deed out of which all subsequent evil deeds arise. It is, as Kant states, the “subjective determining ground of the power of choice that precedes every deed, and is itself not yet a deed” (Religion 6:31).

In making this claim, Kant follows the more Pietist (or less orthodox Lutheran) theologians of his day who broke from an Augustinian approach towards human evil or sin, claiming that each agent is alone responsible for its own evil. Adam and Eve were responsible for their own sin, and all subsequent human beings have followed their example in disobedience to the moral law (Religion 6:42-43). Human beings, then, approach their empirical circumstances having always already chosen the maxim by which they will act, and so subordinate the moral law to the incentive of self-conceit.

An a priori proof for the innate source of this radical evil can easily be drawn out through an examination of Kant’s observation in the Critique of Practical Reason that the moral law strikes down this incentive. Here he states that only two propensities are applicable to beings capable of apprehending the moral law: to follow the moral law either gladly (gern) or reluctantly (ungern; Critque of Practical Reason 5:82).  Whether or not the moral law is followed gladly or reluctantly is in part a function of its ability to generate respect, which serves as an incentive for its adoption. As an incentive, the moral law competes with inclination for acceptance by the practical will, against which inclination sometimes wins. Viewed positively: Respect for the moral law, while illuminating to a certain extent our limitations, also reveals our dignity as rational beings. However, the incentive of respect for the moral law competes with sensuous inclinations which arise out of self-regard (Selbstsucht, solipsismus; Critique of Practical Reason 5:73).

Note that for Kant self-regard is a complex phenomenon. As a rational and guided concern for one’s own livelihood and well being (Eigenliebe, philautia; Critique of Practical Reason 5:74) self-regard constitutes a healthy benevolence towards ourselves. For “we find our nature as sensible beings so constituted that the matter of the faculty of desire (objects of inclination, whether of hope or fear) first forces itself upon us” (Critique of Practical Reason 5:74). However, self-regard also subsumes a more malignant form of self-concern, that of self-conceit (Eigendünkel, arrogantia), in which the “pathologically determinable self” desires “to make its claims primary and originally valid, just as if it constituted our entire self” (Critique of Practical Reason 5:74). In the language of Religion, a healthy self-regard is mechanical self-love, that is an extension of the predisposition to animality in the human being. It is a kind of self-concern for which no reason is required, but it is not immune to the plentitude of vices, including gluttony, lust, and “wild lawlessness” (Religion 6:26-27). But mechanical self-love is entirely different from the malignant self-regard that is self-conceit, which, in conflict with the moral law, arrogantly “prescribes the subjective conditions of [self-love] as laws” (Critique of Practical Reason 5:74).

So, while the moral agent recognizes the requirements of the moral law and wishes to practice self-restraint by virtue of its normative requirements, the moral law is neither universally adopted nor gladly accepted in all cases and at all times. The fact that the moral law does not merely infringe “upon our self-conceit,” but “humiliates every human being when he compares with it the sensible propensity of his nature,” illustrates that this malignant condition is as unavoidable as it is universal (Critique of Practical Reason 5:74).

To return to the issue of radical evil in the Religion, human beings are generally susceptible to natural inclinations that never actually agree with the dictates of the moral law. Rather than naturally possessing a propensity to follow the moral law, humans instead possess a propensity to follow their own self-serving inclinations. Since, as we saw earlier, human beings are wholly good or evil by virtue of whether or not they choose a moral governing maxim or an egoistic alternative at the top of their hierarchy of maxims, this propensity must be evil and imputable to human nature.

4. Overcoming Evil: The Necessity of an Ethical-Religious Revolution

Although Kant, for the most part, dedicates only the first two chapters of the Religion to radical evil, he anticipates some of its issues in the Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals (as heteronomy), in the Critique of Practical Reason, and in the Metaphysics of Morals. He dedicates the remaining two books of Religion to cultivating the idea of an ethical community which requires as a necessary condition for participation that an individual possesses a disposition transformed by a “revolution.” While the revolution may be characterized as a singular event, it is also the first step in a new life of unending progress toward goodness (Religion 6:67). Only through a revolution can an individual claim to have acquired a “holy will.”  The “Kingdom of God on earth,” or the ethical commonwealth, is composed of individuals who have recognized both this need for a revolution and the primacy of the moral law as their governing maxim (Religion 6:95 ff).

While radical evil must be understood in terms of a propensity that is as inexplicable as it is universal, it is nevertheless “imputed to us” as a disposition (Religion 6.43). How we come to choose a good disposition (and overcome evil), is equally unfathomable. The difficulty lies in the fact that acquiring such a disposition cannot merely be a matter of a resolution to try harder next time (though such resolve is of some merit). Nor is a mere change in the habitual practice of virtues sufficient by itself to acquire a good character because the disposition remains corrupted in the midst of such efforts. The only solution is to undergo a revolution in our “mode of thought” (Denkungsart; Religion 6:47). Acquiring an original goodness that constitutes “holiness of maxims” is the acquisition of a disposition in compliance with our duty to the maxim of obedience to the moral law and serves as the basis for our subsequent maxims (Religion 6:47). It should be noted that Kant’s use of ‘revolution’ should not be confused with a social or political revolution, since this would ultimately lead to the Terror witnessed in the French Revolution.

The acquisition of the holy disposition through such a revolution requires that we take up the disposition of the human personification of the holy will, present to us in our reason as the archetype of moral perfection. To elevate ourselves to this ideal of moral perfection constitutes our universal human duty (Religion 6:61-62). Kant identifies the historical human personification of this archetype as the “Son of God.” This individual is described in religious terms as the one who has “descended from Heaven,” whom we come to believe in through “practical faith.” When an agent acquires this disposition, then that agent, by emulating it, may be considered as “not an unworthy object of divine pleasure” (Religion 6:62). We are no longer subject to suffering the moral consequences of our own sin or debt. Yet we are nevertheless obliged to continue to experience the consequences of the life lived prior to the revolution (Religion 6:75n). Indeed, according to Kant, to undergo suffering as the consequence of a “pre-conversion” life is consistent with his views about the development of a good character (Religion 6:69).

The revolution, then, is not merely an intellectual undertaking. It also involves a practical and continual process of reformation of maxims in accordance with the newly acquired governing maxim of “holiness of maxims.” An intelligible (Denkungsart) revolution takes place when a human being makes a singular decision which instantaneously reverses “the supreme ground of his maxims” (Religion 6:48), and precedes a gradual empirical (Sinnesart) reformation of character. The former is the volitional overcoming of the propensity to evil that serves as a basis for maxim choice, a mode that is distinct from that of the empirical reformation (for Kant, they are in fact, two sides of the same coin). For, once an individual has experienced this inner revolution, “he is a good human being only in incessant laboring and becoming, i.e. he can hope –  in view of the purity of the principle –  to find himself upon the good (though narrow) path of constant progress from bad to better” (Religion 6:48).

The operative in question here is that of “manifestation of the good principle,” or “humanity in its moral perfection,” as displayed in the disposition of the Son of God in history (Religion 6:77). Our acquisition of a renewed disposition requires a kind of moral habituation. It is a disposition that results from adopting holiness of maxims as a governing maxim, and subsequently not only serves to systematically root out vice, but aids in the resolution to resist backsliding from temptation—because for Kant, ought implies can. It involves a commitment to the struggle to restructure one’s incentives from top to bottom, as it were, from self-conceit towards virtue; it is to begin to fulfill one’s duties from duty itself.

We may note that by means of this revolution, moral reform does carry with it a degree of uncertainty as to whether or not we will succeed. Hope for success rests on considering our efforts from the divine perspective. For, from this perspective, what matters is a change of heart, or the acquisition of a transformed moral disposition or character. Through such a change, Kant says, “in the sight of the divine judge for whom the disposition takes the place of the deed,” the agent is morally “another being” (Religion 6:74). Because one who has taken on the disposition of the archetype of humanity has become a new creation, the disposition of the personified archetype comes to be considered a kind of work “imputed to us by grace” (Religion 6:75-76). At the same time, Kant also appears to recognize that, in practical terms and from the human perspective, we might need reassurance that our efforts are successful.

On this matter, Kant appears to offer some consolation using the distinction between “narrow” and “perfect” duties on the one hand, and “wide” or “imperfect” duties on the other (Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, 4:424). Narrow or perfect duties clearly constitute tasks that we are required to do or accomplish and are therefore exact in their stipulation. On the other hand, a wide or imperfect duty is one such that, although we are required to strive for it, is not something that we can be expected to attain. Holiness of will is such a duty. For while holiness is narrow and perfect—and constitutes a qualitative ideal—practically considered, it can only be considered a wide duty “because of the frailty (fragilitas) of human nature.” That is: “It is a human being’s duty to strive for this perfection, but not to reach it . . . and his compliance with this duty can, accordingly consist only in continual progress” (The Metaphysics of Morals 6:446). Holiness of will is for us such an ideal, the fulfillment of which we cannot be certain of attaining in this lifetime

Kant’s account of radical evil as a propensity has received much discussion at the turn of the twenty-first century and has generated a fair degree of controversy. One criticism is that he does not allow for the possibility of diabolical evil. A second is that, while Kant is committed to holding that the propensity to evil is universal, his positions on the revolution fail to properly allow for the possibility of grace, the doctrine that God is able to act in human affairs and effect change within a person’s moral disposition. This paper does not attempt to adjudicate between these two concerns, and they do not affect the main thesis that for Kant, evil is largely a moral category, present universally in human beings as a propensity to self-conceit that influences the adoption of maxims.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary References

i. German

  • Immanuel Kant. Bereitstellung und Pflege von Kants Gesarmmelten Werken in elektronisher Form. 2008.
    • References and quotations in this encyclopedia article have used the English translation of Kant’s works provided by Cambridge University Press, but the textual references themselves are to Kant’s Gesarmmelten Werken that is available online.

ii. English

  • Kant, Immanuel. Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, trans. and ed. by M. J. Gregor. In Immanuel Kant: Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Kant, Immanuel. Critique of Practical Reason, trans and ed. by M. J. Gregor. In Immanuel Kant: Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Kant, Immanuel. The Metaphysics of Morals, trans. and ed. by M.J. Gregor. In The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Kant, Immanuel. Religion Within the Boundaries of Mere Reason. In Immanuel Kant: Religion and Rational Theology, trans. and ed. by A. W. Wood and G. diGiovanni. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.

b. Secondary References

  • Allison, Henry. Kant’s Theory of Freedom. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
    • First to propose the Rigorism Thesis and Incorporation Thesis, and the propensity to evil as an intelligible act.
  • Allison, Henry. “On the Very Idea of a Propensity to Evil.” The Journal of Value Inquiry 36 (2002): 337-48.
    • Defends propensity to evil as intelligible act against Wood’s thesis that the propensity to evil is mere “unsociable sociality.” Many subsequent articles tend to defend either Allison or Wood.
  • Anderson-Gold, Sharon. “God and Community: An Inquiry into the Religious Implications of the Highest Good.” In Rossi and Wreen (1991), pp. 113-131.
    • An important contribution to the discussion on the significance of evil within Kant’s anthropology.
  • Anderson-Gold, Sharon. Unnecessary Evil. New York: State University of New York Press, 2001.
  • Anderson-Gold, Sharon, and Pablo Muchnik (eds). Kant’s Autonomy of Evil: Interpretive Essays and Contemporary Applications. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Caswell, Matthew. “Kant’s Conception of the Highest Good, the Gesinnung, and the Theory of Radical Evil.” Kant-Studien 97 (2006): 184-209.
    • Offers discussion on importance of the disposition for the acquisition of evil as an alternative incentive to the Good. Caswell largely follows Allison’s thesis.
  • Caswell, Matthew. “The Value of Humanity and Kant’s Conception of Evil.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 44.4 (2006): 635-63.
  • Fackenheim, Emil. “Kant and Radical Evil.” University of Toronto Quarterly 23 (1954): 339-53.
    • Raises questions about whether Kant’s apparent claim that each person is responsible for “self-redemption” is consistent within his Religion as a whole.
  • Grimm, Stephen. “Kant’s Argument for Radical Evil.” European Journal of Philosophy 10:2 (2002): 160-77.
    • By and large a defense of Wood’s position.
  • Kosch, Michelle. Freedom and Reason in Kant, Schelling, and Kierkegaard. Oxford/New York: Clarendon, 2006.
    • A discussion of Kant’s ethics of autonomy, and offers an account of the challenge faced by radical evil to Kant’s ethics of autonomy; for the most part follows Wood’s thesis against Allison.
  • Mariña, Jacqueline, “Kant on Grace: A Reply to His Critics.” Religious Studies 33 (1997): 379-400.
    • Presents a defense of Kant against Wolterstorf and Michalson for the compatibility of Kant’s Religion on the topic of the possibility of grace.
  • Matuštík, Martin Beck. Radical Evil and the Scarcity of Hope. Bloomington/ Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2008.
    • Chapter 8 offers contemporary criticism of Kant, largely following Silber, arguing that Kant’s account of evil is restricted by his commitment to resisting diabolical evil.
  • Michalson Jr., Gordon. Fallen Freedom. Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
    • While offering excellent commentary on Religion 1 & 2, critiques Kant’s treatment of grace and Christian theism generally.
  • Morgan, Seiriol. “The Missing Proof of Humanity’s Radical Evil in Kant’s Religion.” The Philosophical Review 114.1 (2005): 63-114.
    • Offers alternative proof for thesis that the propensity to evil is an intelligible act.
  • Muchnik, Pablo, “An Alternative Proof of the Universal Propensity to Evil.” In Sharon Anderson-Gold and Pablo Muchnik (2010), pp. 116-143.
    • Presents an alternative proof for evil as an innate propensity from Wood and Allison.
  • Quinn, Philip. “In Adam’s Fall, We Sinned All,” Philosophical Topics 16 (1988): 110-118.
    • Quinn was the first to present the propensity to evil, and its adoption by the disposition, understanding the disposition (Gesinnung) as the ‘meta-maxim’.
  • Quinn, Philip. “Saving Faith from Kant’s Remarkable Antinomy,” Faith and Philosophy 7.4 (1990): 418-433.
  • Reath, Andrews. “Kant’s Theory of Moral Sensibility: Respect for the Moral Law and the Influence of Inclination,” in his Agency and Autonomy in Kant’s Moral Theory, Oxford: Clarendon (2006), pp. 8-32.
  • Provides an excellent analysis of the importance in understanding respect as an incentive for the moral law.
  • Rossi, Philip J. and Michael J. Wreen. Kant’s Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1991.
  • Savage, Denis. “Kant’s Rejection of Divine Revelation and his Theory of Radical Evil.” Rossi and Wreen (1991), pp. 54-76.
    • Presents skepticism of Kant’s willingness to allow for revelation in his Religion.
  • Silber, John. “The Ethical Significance of Kant’s Religion.” In Immanuel Kant, Religion Within  the Limits of Reason Alone. Trans. T.M. Greene and H.H. Hudson, New York: Harper and Row, 1960.
  • Silber’s introduction raises questions about the viability of Kant’s treatment of evil, given that it does not allow for the possibility of diabolical evil.
  • Silber, John. “Kant at Auschwitz.” Proceedings of the Sixth International Kant Congress. Ed. by G. Funke and T. Seebohm, Center of Advanced Research in Phenomenology and Research: University Press of America, 1991.
    • A defense of his earlier claim (1960), that Kant’s account of radical evil does not do justice to instances of diabolical evil in the twentieth century.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas. “Conundrums in Kant’s Rational Religion.” In Rossi and Wreen (1991), pp. 40-53.
    • Raises questions about whether or not Kant’s Religion is consistent with Christian theism.
  • Wood, Allen. Kant’s Moral Religion. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press, 1970.
    • A discussion of Wood’s earlier views on Kant’s religion.
  • Wood, Allen. Kant’s Ethical Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
    • Chapter 9 develops his views of radical evil in terms of unsociable sociality against Allison.
  • Wood, Allen. “Kant and the Intelligibility of Evil.” In Sharon Anderson-Gold and Pablo Muchnik (2010), pp. 144-172.
    • Makes extensive use of Kant’s Anthropology for a defense of his thesis of radical evil as unsociable sociality, implicitly against Allison.


Author Information

Erik M. Hanson
University of Colorado
U. S. A.

Constructive Mathematics

Constructive mathematics is positively characterized by the requirement that proof be algorithmic. Loosely speaking, this means that when a (mathematical) object is asserted to exist, an explicit example is given: a constructive existence proof demonstrates the existence of a mathematical object by outlining a method of finding ("constructing") such an object. The emphasis in constructive theory is placed on hands-on provability, instead of on an abstract notion of truth. The classical concept of validity is starkly contrasted with the constructive notion of proof. An implication (A⟹B) is not equivalent to a disjunction (¬A∨B), and neither are equivalent to a negated conjunction (¬(A∧¬B)). In practice, constructive mathematics may be viewed as mathematics done using intuitionistic logic.

With the advent of the computer, much more emphasis has been placed on algorithmic procedures for obtaining numerical results, and constructive mathematics has come into its own. For, a constructive proof is exactly that: an algorithmic procedure for obtaining a conclusion from a set of hypotheses.

The historical and philosophical picture is complex; various forms of constructivism have developed over time. Presented here is a brief introduction to several of the more widely accepted approaches, and is by no means comprehensive.

Table of Contents

  1. Motivation and History
    1. An Example
    2. Constructivism as Philosophy
    3. The BHK Interpretation
    4. Constructive Methods in Mathematics
    5. Early History
    6. The Axiom of Choice
  2. Intuitionism
    1. Brouwerian Counterexamples
    2. The Fan Theorem
  3. Constructive Recursive Mathematics
    1. Surprises
  4. Bishop's Constructive Mathematics
    1. Proof Readability and Preservation of Numerical Meaning
    2. The Axiom of Choice in BISH
    3. Foundations and Advances
  5. Martin-Löf Type Theory
    1. The Axiom of Choice is Provable
  6. Constructive Reverse Mathematics
  7. Summary
    1. Some Further Remarks
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Further Reading
    2. References

1. Motivation and History

The origin of modern constructive mathematics lies in the foundational debate at the turn of the 20th Century. At that time, the German mathematician David Hilbert established some very deep and far-reaching existence theorems using non-constructive methods. Around the same time, the Dutch mathematician L.E.J. Brouwer became philosophically convinced that the universal validity of contradiction proofs for existence proofs was unwarranted—despite his early work in establishing the non-constructive fixed point theorem which now bears his name.

It is often the case that a classical theorem becomes more enlightening when seen from the constructive viewpoint (we meet an example of such a case—the least upper bound principle—in Section 1d. It would, however, be unfair to say that constructive mathematics is revisionist in nature. Indeed, Brouwer proved his Fan Theorem (see Section 2b) intuitionistically in 1927 (Brouwer, 1927), but the first proof of König's Lemma (its classical equivalent) only appeared in 1936 (König, 1936). It is ironic that the Brouwer's intuitionist position (see Section 2) has become known as anti-realist since it demands that every object be explicitly constructible.

a. An example

Here is an example of a non-constructive proof that is commonly encountered in the literature:

There exist non-rational numbers a and b such that ab is rational.

Proof. Take b=2; so b is irrational. Either 22 is rational, or it is not. If it is, then set a=2. On the other hand, if 22 is irrational, then take a=22, which makes ab = 2 and thus rational. In either case, the conclusion holds.

The proof is non-constructive because even though it shows that the non-existence of such numbers would be contradictory, it leaves us without the knowledge of which choice of a and b satisfy the theorem. There is a (simple) constructive proof of this theorem: set a=2 and b=log29 (in the full constructive proof, a little work first needs to be done to demonstrate that a and b are, in fact, irrational). A fully constructive proof that 2 is properly irrational (that is, positively bounded away from every rational number) may be found in Bishop (1973). This clarifies the choice of words in the proposition above. It is further possible to show that 22 is in fact irrational, but this is not done by the proof presented here. (An early mention of the above illustrative example in the literature is in Dummett (1977, p. 10).)

b. Constructivism as philosophy

Constructive mathematics is often mis-characterized as classical mathematics without the axiom of choice (see Section 1f); or classical mathematics without the Law of Excluded Middle. But seen from within the discipline, constructive mathematics is positively characterized by a strict provability requirement. The consequences of adopting this stance—and rigorously implementing it—are far-reaching, as will be seen.

There are two conditions which are fundamental to every constructivist philosophy:

  • The notion of `truth' is not taken as primitive; rather, a proposition is considered true only when a proof for the proposition is produced.
  • The notion of `existence' is taken to be constructibility: when an object is proved to exist, the proof also exhibits how to find it.

To assert that P, then, is to produce a proof that P. Likewise, to assert that ¬P is to prove that the assumption of P leads to a contradiction. Very quickly, one realizes that the Principle of Excluded Middle (PEM; Latin tertium non datur or principium tertii exclusi) leads to trouble:

PEM: For any statement P, either P or ¬P.

The assertion of PEM constructively amounts to claiming that, for any given statement P, either there is a proof of P, or there is a proof that P leads to a contradiction. Consider, for example, the following:

The Collatz conjecture. Define f:NN by the rule:

f(n)={n/23n+1if n is even,if n is odd.

Then for each natural number n, that is for each n in {1,2,3,...}, there exists a natural number k such that fk(n)=1.

At the time of writing this article, the Collatz conjecture remains unsolved. To claim that there is a proof of it is erroneous; likewise to claim that there is a proof that it leads to a contradiction is also erroneous. In fact, in Brouwer's view (see Section 2), to assert PEM is to claim that any mathematical problem has a solution. Thus there are good philosophical grounds for rejecting PEM.

c. The BHK interpretation

The following interpretation of logical connectives is now known as the Brouwer-Heyting-Kolmogorov (BHK) interpretation, and is widely accepted by constructivists.

Statement Interpretation
P We have a proof of P.
PQ We have both a proof of P and a proof of Q.
PQ We have either a proof of P or a proof of Q.
PQ We have an algorithm that converts any proof of P into a proof of Q.
¬P We have a proof that P, where is absurd (for example, 0=1).
xAP(x) We have an algorithm which computes an object xA and confirms that P(x).
xAP(x) We have an algorithm which, given any object x, together with the data that xA, shows that P(x) holds.

In particular, the interpretations for ¬,, and are worth emphasizing: each of these has the very strict requirement that a proof of such a statement will consist of a decision procedure—in other words, every constructive proof contains, in principle, an algorithm.

The BHK interpretation characterizes a logic called intuitionistic logic. Every form of constructive mathematics has intuitionistic logic at its core; different schools have different additional principles or axioms given by the particular approach to constructivism.

d. Constructive methods in mathematics

Upon adopting only constructive methods, we lose some powerful proof tools commonly used in classical mathematics. We have already seen that the Principle of Excluded Middle is highly suspect from the constructivist viewpoint, as (under the BHK interpretation) it claims the existence of a universal algorithm to determine the truth of any given statement. This is not to say that PEM is constructively false, however. Both Russian recursive mathematics (in which PEM is provably false) and classical mathematics (in which it is logically true) are in a sense models, or interpretations, of constructive mathematics. So in a way, PEM is independent of constructive mathematics. Note, however, that if one is given a statement, it may be possible to prove PEM concerning that particular statement—such statements are called decidable. The point is that there is no general constructive method for doing so for all statements.

If PEM is not universally valid we also lose universal applicability of any mode of argument which validates it. For example, double negation elimination, or proof by contradiction. Again, it must be emphasized that it is only the universal applicability which is challenged: proof by contradiction is constructively just fine for proving negative statements; and double negation elimination is just fine for decidable statements.

However these limitations are in fact often advantages. In a lot of cases, constructive alternatives to non-constructive classical principles in mathematics exist, leading to results which are often constructively stronger than their classical counterpart. For example, the classical least upper bound principle (LUB) is not constructively provable:

LUB: Any nonempty set of real numbers that is bounded from above has a least upper bound.

The constructive least upper bound principle, by contrast, is constructively provable (Bishop & Bridges, 1985, p. 37):

CLUB: Any order-located nonempty set of reals that is bounded from above has a least upper bound.

A set is order-located if given any real x, the distance from x to the set is computable.
It is quite common for a constructive alternative to be classically equivalent to the classical principle; and, indeed, classically every nonempty set of reals is order-located.

To see why LUB is not provable, we may consider a so-called Brouwerian counterexample (see Section 2a), such as the set


where P is some as-yet unproven statement, such as Goldbach's conjecture that every even number greater than 2 is the sum of two prime numbers. (There may be some philosophical problems with this set; however these do not matter for the purpose of this example. Section 2a has a much "cleaner", though more technically involved, example.) If the set S had a computable least upper bound, then we would have a quick proof of the truth or falsity of Goldbach's conjecture. A Brouwerian counterexample is an example which shows that if a certain property holds, then it is possible to constructively prove a non-constructive principle (such as PEM); and thus the property itself must be essentially non-constructive.

e. Early history

In the late 19th century, the mathematical community embarked on a search for foundations: unquestionable solid ground on which mathematical theorems could be proved. An early exemplar of this search is Kronecker's 1887 paper "Über den Zahlbegriff" ("On the Concept of Number") (Kronecker, 1887), where he outlines the project of arithmetization (that is, founding on the fundamental notion of number) of analysis and algebra. It is perhaps in this work that we see the earliest instance of the constructive manifesto in mathematical practice. Kronecker was famously quoted by Weber (1893) as saying "Die ganzen Zahlen hat der liebe Gott gemacht, alles andere ist Menschenwerk." ("The integers were made by God; all else is the work of man.")

It has been said that "almost all mathematical proofs before 1888 were essentially constructive." (Beeson, 1985, p. 418). This is not to say that constructive mathematics, as currently conceived of, was common practice; but rather that the natural interpretation of existence of the time was existence in the constructive sense. As mathematical concepts have changed over time, however, old proofs have taken on new meaning. There are thus plenty of examples of results which are today regarded as essentially non-constructive, but seen within the context of the period during which they were written, the objects of study that the authors had in mind allowed proofs of a constructive nature. One good example of this is Cauchy's 1821 proof of the Intermediate Value Theorem (Cauchy, 1821; in Bradley & Sandifer, 2009, pp. 309–312); the classical interval-halving argument. The concept of "function" has, since then, expanded to include objects which allow for Brouwerian counterexamples (see Section 2a).

The first major systematic development of a constructive approach to mathematics is that of Brouwer and the intuitionists, introduced in the next major section. Some notable forerunners (who should perhaps not be thought of as intuitionists themselves) were Henri Poincaré, who argued that mathematics is in a way more immediate than logic, and Emile Borel, who maintained that the only objects that concern science are those that can be effectively defined (Borel, 1914). Poincaré argues that intuition is a necessary component of mathematical thought, rejects the idea of an actual infinite, and argues that mathematical induction is an unprovable fact (Poincaré, 1908).

As a result of techniques from ZF set theory, rigorous proofs have over time taken on non-constructive aspects. David Hilbert, contemporary of Brouwer and an opponent of Brouwer's philosophy, deserves particular mention, since he was an early pioneer of highly non-constructive techniques. The debate between Brouwer and Hilbert grew fierce and controversial, which perhaps added fuel to the development of both constructivism (à la Brouwer) and formalism (à la Hilbert) (see, for example, van Heijenoort, 1976). The spectacular 1890 proof by Hilbert of his famous basis theorem (Hilbert, 1890), showing the existence of a finite set of generators for the invariants of quantics, was greeted by the German mathematician Gordan with another now-(in)famous phrase: "Das ist nicht Mathematik. Das ist Theologie." ("That is not Mathematics. That is Theology.") This is perhaps the most dramatic example of a non-constructive proof, relying on PEM in an infinite extension.

The method Hilbert exhibited there has become widely accepted by the mathematics community as a pure existence proof (that is, proving that non-existence of such an object was contradictory without actually exhibiting the object); however it was not admissible as a constructive technique. Weyl, one of Hilbert's students (who Hilbert would eventually "lose"—perhaps temporarily—to intuitionism) commented on pure existence proofs, that they "inform the world that a treasure exists without disclosing its location" (Weyl, 1946). The Axiom of Choice, perhaps due in part to its regular use in many non-constructive proofs (and heavily implicated in many of Hilbert's most influential proofs), has been accused of being the source of non-constructivity in mathematics.

f. The Axiom of Choice

The Axiom of Choice (AC) has been controversial to varying degrees in mathematics ever since it was recognized by Zermelo (1904). Loosely, it states that given a collection of non-empty sets, we can choose exactly one item from each set.

AC: If to each x in A there corresponds a y in B, then there is a function f such that f(x) is in B whenever x is in A.

Formally, given non-empty sets A and B, the Axiom may be stated as:


Intuitively, this seems almost trivial, and the case where the non-empty sets are finite in size is indeed so, since one does not need the axiom of choice to prove that such a choice can be made in most formulations of set theory. However it becomes less clear when the size of the sets involved is very large or somehow not easily determined. In such cases, a principled, functional choice may not necessarily be made. Even in classical mathematics, the axiom of choice is occasionally viewed with some suspicion: it leads to results that are surprising and counterintuitive, such as the Banach-Tarski paradox: using the axiom of choice allows one to take a solid sphere in 3-dimensional space, decompose it into a finite number of non-overlapping pieces, and reassemble the pieces (using only rotations and translations) into two solid spheres, each with volume identical to the original sphere. Due to its controversial nature, many mathematicians will explicitly state when and where in their proof AC has been used.

Nonetheless, the BHK interpretation of the quantifiers seems to invite one to think about the existential quantifier yB as defining the choice function, and so it would seem very natural to adopt AC from the constructive point of view (see, however, the discussion in Sections 4b and 5a). But consider the set S given by


for some syntactically correct statement P. This set is not empty, since if it were then both P and ¬P would have to be false; so ¬P¬¬P, a contradiction. Similarly, S cannot contain both 0 and 1. But suppose that we had an algorithmic procedure which (in a finite time) returns an element of S for us. If it returns 0, then we know that P must be true; whereas if it returns 1 then we know that P must be false—and thus we will have proved that P¬P. We may repeat this for any statement, and so this amounts to a (constructive) proof of the universal applicability of PEM. And as we have seen, universal applicability of PEM is not constructively acceptable. Thus, while the set S is non-empty, we cannot necessarily exhibit any of its members either. A set which has constructible members is called inhabited, and the distinction between inhabited and non-empty sets is key in constructive set theories. Related is the issue of the size of S; since S is not empty, its size is not 0, but since S is not (necessarily) inhabited, its size is no other natural number either—S is an at-most-singleton set. It is a consquence of AC, in fact, that every non-empty set is inhabited.

It is no coincidence that the symbolic form of AC suggests that it is essentially a quantifier swap: AC states that if to each element of A an element of B can be assigned, then it can be done so in a systematic (algorithmic) way. It is thus a kind of uniformity principle.

The example set S above is known as a Brouwerian example (although most of Brouwer's examples of this sort were a little more specific—see below). It is to intuitionism, Brouwer's philosophy of mathematics, that we now turn.

2. Intuitionism

If there is a name synonymous with constructive mathematics, it is L.E.J. Brouwer (Luitzen Egbertus Jan Brouwer; Bertus to his friends). In his doctoral thesis, Over de Grondslagen der Wiskunde (On the Foundations of Mathematics; Brouwer, 1907), Brouwer began his program of laying the foundations of constructive mathematics in a systematic way. Brouwer's particular type of constructive mathematics is called "intuitionism" or "intuitionistic mathematics" (not to be confused with intuitionistic logic; recall Section 1c).

Shortly after the presentation of his thesis, Brouwer wrote a paper entitled "De onbetrouwbaarheid der logische principes" ("The Untrustworthiness of the Principles of Logic"; Brouwer, 1908), in which he challenged the absolute validity of classical logic: "De vraag naar de geldigheid van het principium tertii exclusi is dus aequivalent met de vraag naar de mogelijkheid van onoplosbare wiskundige problemen." ("The question of validity of the principle of excluded third is equivalent to the question of the possibility of unsolvable mathematical problems."; Brouwer, 1908, p. 156) In other words, PEM is valid only if there are no unsolvable mathematical problems.

In intuitionistic mathematics, mathematics is seen as a free creation of the human mind: a (mathematical) object exists just in case it can be (mentally) constructed. This immediately justifies the BHK interpretation, since any existence proof cannot be a proof-by-contradiction—the contradiction leaves us without a construction of the object.

According to Brouwer, the natural numbers and (perhaps surprisingly) the continuum, are primitive notions given directly by intuition alone. This connects to the idea of what Brouwer called free choice sequence, a generalization of the notion of sequence. It is perhaps ironic that when Brouwer initially encountered the idea of a free choice sequence, which had been a mathematical curiosity at the time, he rejected such sequences as non-intuitionistic (Brouwer, 1912). However, soon afterward he accepted them and was the first to discover how important they were to practical constructive mathematics (Brouwer, 1914). This is one of two major aspects which distinguishes intuitionistic mathematics from other kinds of constructive mathematics (the second being Brouwer's technique of bar induction, which we do not explain in great depth here; though see Section 2b).

A free choice sequence is given by a constructing agent (Brouwer's creative subject), who is at any stage of the progression of a sequence free to choose (or subject to mild restrictions) the next member of the sequence. For example, if one is asked to produce a binary free choice sequence, one may start "0000" for a hundred digits, and then (perhaps unexpectedly) freely choose "1" as the next digit. A real number, classically thought of as a (converging) Cauchy sequence, thus need not be given by a determinate rule; instead, it is only subject to a Cauchy restriction (that is, some rate of convergence).

The idea of a free choice sequence leads to some very strong commitments. Not immediately obvious is the principle of continuous choice. It states:

If PNN×N and for each x in NN there exists n in N such that (x,n) is in P, then there is a choice function f:NNN such that (x,f(x)) is in P for all x in NN.

The notation BA, where A and B are sets, denotes the collection of functions from A to B. So NN denotes the collection of functions from natural numbers to natural numbers; the arguments x in question are thus actually functions x:NN. One may conceive of these (as Brouwer did) as sequences of natural numbers; further technical details are omitted.

Intuitively, the principle arises from the following considerations. Let PNN×N and suppose that we have a procedure that we may apply to any given sequence x=x1,x2,x3, of natural numbers which computes an index n such that (x,n)P—that is, P is a set in which every sequence of natural numbers is (constructively) paired with some natural number. Under the intuitionist's view, at any given moment we may have only a finite number of terms of x at hand. The procedure which computes n such that (x,n)P must thus do so after being given only a finite initial fragment of x; say x1,x2,,xm. Now if we are given another sequence y, if the first m terms of y are the same as those of x (that is, if y is "close" to x in some sense), then the procedure must return the same value of n for y as it would give for x. The procedure is thus a continuous function (the choice function) from NN to N.

The principle of continuous choice is a restricted form of the classical axiom of choice (see Section 1f). This principle (together with the BHK interpretation) gives rise to a number of very strong consequences—perhaps the most (in)famous being that every function f:RR which maps the real line into itself is pointwise continuous.

If this seems outlandish, then remember that in intuitionistic mathematics the very ideas of "function" and "real number" are different from their classical counterparts. We now discuss a technique that originated with Brouwer which justifies, to some extent, these conceptions.

a. Brouwerian counterexamples

As we have seen, Brouwer rejected the principle of excluded middle. The intuitionist school further rejects appeal to so-called omniscience principles; logical principles which allow one to decide the truth of predicates over an infinite number of things. An illuminating example of such a principle is the limited principle of omniscience (LPO), which states that:

For each binary sequence a1a2a3, either an=0 for all natural numbers n or there exists a natural number n such that an=1.

In symbols LPO states that, for any given binary sequence a1a2a3, the following statement is decidable:


For one familiar with computability, the above statement will already appear problematical. It says that there is an algorithm which, given an arbitrary binary sequence will in finite time determine either that all the terms in α are zero, or it will output an n such that an=1. Since computers have a finite memory capacity, the problem of loss of significance (or underflow) occurs: the computer carrying out the calculation may not carry enough digits of the sequence to determine whether a 1 occurs or not (though see Section 3).

However, (modern) computational issues aside, this was not the problem seen by the intuitionist. To Brouwer, the possible existence of choice sequences made this statement unacceptable. Since a constructing agent is free to insert a 1 while constructing a sequence at any stage of the construction, there is no a priori bound on how many terms one may need to search in order to establish the presence, or lack of, a 1.

Thus we see that the lesser principle of omniscience does not apply to binary sequences in intuitionist mathematics. Let us now turn to the real numbers. The decimal expansion of π is a favourite example. There are well-known algorithms for computing π to arbitrary precision, limited only by the power of the device on which the algorithms run. At the time of writing this article, it is unkown whether a string of 100 successive 0s (that is, 0000, with 100 digits) appears in the decimal expansion of π. It is known that π does not have a terminating decimal expansion (so it does not finish in all 0s) and that it has no systematic repetition (since it is not a rational number).

But suppose we define a real number x by the expansion


where an is defined as

an={01if a hundred consecutive 0s have not occurred by the nth digit of π's expansionotherwise.

The number x is constructible: we have prescribed an algorithm for computing it to any desired precision. It also has a Cauchy condition—the 1/2n part—which ensures it converges. However, we now have a problem as regards the sign of x: if a hundred consecutive 0s never occur in the decimal expansion of π, then x=0. If a hundred consecutive 0s do occur in the decimal expansion of π, and the hundredth such 0 occurs in an odd place, then x<0; whereas if it occurs in an even place then x>0. So if we have an answer to the question whether such a string occurs in the decimal expansion of π, then we can determine whether x=0 or not; however, since we do not have an answer, we cannot conclude that x>0, or x=0, or x<0.

The previous paragraph is a Brouwerian counterexample to the statement "every real number satisfies the law of trichotomy". Trichotomy is exactly the decision (disjunction) that every real number is either positive, zero, or negative. Under Brouwer's view, we may construct real numbers about which we simply do not have enough information at hand—even in principle—to determine their sign.

b. The Fan Theorem

In addition to the use of intuitionistic logic and the principle of continuous choice, Brouwer's intuitionism involves one final central technique, bar induction. It is a technically challenging idea which we do not cover in depth here (see Beeson, 1985, p. 51 or Troelstra & van Dalen, 1988, p. 229 for detail; see also Bridges, Dent & McKubre-Jordens, 2012). Bar induction is a key principle which allowed Brouwer to prove his Fan Theorem; we will outline the theorem for the binary fan, demonstrating the significance of the fan theorem.

The (complete) binary fan is the collection of all (finite) sequences of 0s and 1s (including the empty sequence). Diagrammatically, we may draw a tree-like diagram (the "fan") with a binary split for each branch at each level; one branch corresponds to 0, another to 1. A path through the binary fan is a sequence (finite or infinite) of 0s and 1s. Compare then:

  • A bar of the binary fan is a set of `cut-offs', such that for each infinite path α through the fan there exists a natural number n such that the first n terms of α are `in the bar'.
  • A bar of the binary fan is uniform if there exists a natural number N such that for each infinite path α through the fan, there is some kN such that the first k terms of α are in the bar.

Note the quantifier shift: we go from "for each path there exists n…" to "there exists N such that for each path …". Brouwer's fan theorem for the binary fan then states that

FAN: Every bar of the binary fan is uniform.

The classical contrapositive of the fan theorem, well-known in graph theory, is König's Lemma: if for every n there exists a path of length n which does not hit the bar, then there exists an infinite path that is not in the bar.

As mentioned, the fact that Brouwer's proof of the fan theorem (1927) was published nine years before König's proof of his Lemma (1936) shows the innaccuracy of the criticism sometimes held that constructive mathematics is revisionist. Indeed, as is shown by the Gödel-Gentzen negative translation (Gödel, 1933), every classical theorem may be translated into a constructive theorem (some of which are not very informative); and so constructive mathematics can be interpreted as a generalization of classical mathematics. If one adds PEM to intuitionistic logic, then the full classical system is recovered. (Of course, the reverse view may also be argued for—that classical mathematics is a generalization of constructive methods.)

3. Constructive recursive mathematics

In the 1930s, amidst developments in what is now known as computer science, concepts of algorithmic computability were formalised. The well-known Turing machines, λ-calculus, combinatory logic and the like arose. These were proved to be equivalent, leading Church, Turing and Markov to postulate the thesis now known as the Church-Markov-Turing thesis (or the Church-Turing thesis, or simply Church's thesis):

CMT: a function is computable if and only if it is computable by a Turing machine.

Markov's work, based in what he called normal algorithms (now known as Markov algorithms; Markov, 1954) was essentially recursive function theory employing intuitionistic logic. In this type of constructive mathematics, the groundwork for which was done in the 40s and 50s, Church's thesis is accepted as true (as it is to classical mathematicians, by and large). Moreover, in Markov's school, Markov's Principle of unbounded search is accepted:

MP: For any binary sequence, if it is impossible that all the terms are zero, then there exists a term equal to 1.

This reflects the idea that if it is contradictory for all the terms to be zero, then (although we do not have an a priori bound on how far in the sequence we must seek) eventually any machine that is looking for a 1 will find one in finite (possibly large) time.

While MP may seem like a kind of omniscience principle, there is a distinct difference: the implication PQ is, under the BHK interpretation, weaker than the disjunction ¬PQ. An algorithm which takes any (correct) proofs of P and turns them into (correct) proofs of Q does not leave us any the wiser which of ¬P or Q is actually the case. In part because of this, the constructive status of this principle is not so clear. While the omniscience principles are not accepted by any school of constructivism, there is at least pragmatic (that is, computer-implementable) reason to admit MP: the algorithm which will compute the 1 in a binary sequence for which it is impossible that all terms are 0 is simply to carry on the process of writing the sequence down until you come across a 1. Of course, MP does not provide a guarantee that a 1 will be found in a sequence before, say, the extinction of the human race, or the heat death of the universe.

Recursive function theory with intuitionistic logic and Markov's principle is known as Russian recursive mathematics. If Markov's principle is omitted, this leaves constructive recursive mathematics more generally—however, there appear to be few current practitioners of this style of mathematics (Beeson, 1985, p. 48).

A central tenet of recursive function theory, is the following axiom of Computable Partial Functions:

CPF: There is an enumeration of the set of all computable partial functions from N to N with countable domains.

Much may be deduced using this seemingly innocuous axiom. For example, PEM (and weakenings thereof, such as LPO) may be shown to be (perhaps surprisingly) simply false within the theory.

a. Surprises

Constructive recursive mathematics presents other surprises as well. Constructivists are already skeptical about PEM, LPO, and other wide-reaching principles. However, some amazing (and classically contradictory) results can be obtained, such as Specker's theorem (Specker, 1949):

There exists a strictly increasing sequence (xn)n1 of rational numbers in the closed interval [0,1] that is eventually bounded away from each real number in [0,1].

To be `eventually bounded away from a number x' means that, given the number x, one may calculate a positive integer N and a positive distance δ such that the distance from x to xk is at least δ whenever kN.

Of course such sequences cannot be uniformly bounded away from the whole of [0,1], otherwise they could not progress within [0,1] past this uniform bound (again, there is a quantifier swap, from the pointwise property xN,δ to the uniform property N,δx—recall Section 2b). While it seems like a contradictory result, the theorem becomes clear when one considers the objects of study: sequences (and functions) and real numbers, are recursive sequences and real numbers; so Specker sequences are sequences which classically converge to non-recursive numbers.

Another interesting result is the constructive existence, within this theory, of a recursive function from [0,1] to the reals which is everywhere pointwise continuous yet not uniformly continuous (as such a function would be both classically and intuitionistically, as a consequence of Brouwer's fan theorem).

4. Bishop's constructive mathematics

In 1967 Errett Bishop published the seminal monograph Foundations of Constructive Analysis (Bishop, 1967). Not only did this assuage the worries expressed by some leading mathematicians (such as Weyl) about the feasibility of constructive proofs in analysis, but it helped lay the foundation for a programme of mathematical research that has flourished since. It captures the numerical content of a large part of the classical research programme and has become the standard for constructive mathematics in the broader sense, as we will shortly see.

a. Proof readability and preservation of numerical meaning

Bishop refused to formally define the notion of algorithm in the BHK interpretation. It is in part this quality which lends Bishop-style constructive mathematics (BISH) the following property: every other model of constructive mathematics, philosophical background notwithstanding, can be seen as an interpretation of Bishop's constructive mathematics where some further assumptions have been added. For example, intuitionistic mathematics is BISH together with bar induction and continuous choice; and (Russian) constructive recursive mathematics is BISH together with the Computable Partial Functions axiom and Markov's Principle. Even classical mathematics—or mathematics with classical two-valued logic—can be seen as a model of Bishop-style constructive mathematics where the principle of excluded middle is added as axiom.

Another factor that contributes to this versatility is the fact that Bishop did not add extra philosophical commitments to the programme of his constructive mathematics, beyond the commitment of ensuring that every theorem has numerical meaning (Bishop, 1975). The idea of preserving numerical meaning is intuitive: the numerical content of any fact given in the conclusion of a theorem must somehow be algorithmically linked to (or preserved from) the numerical content of the hypotheses. Thus BISH may be used to study the same objects as the classical mathematician (or the recursive function theorist, or the intuitionist). As a result, a proof in Bishop-style mathematics can be read, understood, and accepted as correct, by everyone (Beeson, 1985, p. 49) (barring perhaps the paraconsistentists, for whom the disjunctive syllogism, weakening, and contraction—accepted under BHK—portend trouble).

At heart, Bishop's constructive mathematics is simply mathematics done with intuitionistic logic, and may be regarded as "constructive mathematics for the working mathematician" (Troelstra & van Dalen, 1988, p. 28). If one reads a Bishop-style proof, the classical analyst will recognize it as mathematics, even if some of the moves made within the proof seem slightly strange to those unaccustomed to preserving numerical meaning. Further, BISH can be interpreted in theories of computable mathematics, such as Weihrauch's Type 2 effectivity theory (Weihrauch, 2000).

b. The Axiom of Choice in BISH

One (in)famous claim Bishop makes is that "A choice function exists in constructive mathematics, because a choice is implied by the very meaning of existence" (Bishop & Bridges, 1985, p. 12). The axiom is in fact provable in some constructive theories (see Section 5). However, Diaconescu has shown that AC implies PEM, so it would seem that constructivists ought to accept PEM after all (the proof in Diaconescu (1975) is actually remarkably simple). And as we have seen, for some constructivists it would actually be inconsistent to accept PEM. It thus seems that AC, while very important, presents a significant problem for constructivists. However, as we now discuss, such a conclusion is hasty and unjustified.

The key observation to make regards the interpretation of the quantifiers. AC comes out as provable only when we interpret the quantifiers under BHK: for then the hypothesis xAyBP(x,y) says that there is an algorithm which takes us from elements x of A together with the data that x belongs to A, to an element y of B. Thus only if there is no extra work to be done beyond the construction of x in showing that x is a member of A (that is, if this can be done uniformly) will this be a genuine function from A to B. We will revisit this in Section 5. Thus the classical interperatation of AC is not valid under BHK, and PEM cannot be problematically derived.

Let us return to Bishop's statement at the start of this section, regarding the existence of a choice function being implied by the meaning of existence. The context in which his claim was made illuminates the situation. The passage (Bishop & Bridges, 1985, p. 12) goes on to read: "[Typical] applications of the axiom of choice in classical mathematics either are irrelevant or are combined with a sweeping use of the principle of omniscience." This also shows that blaming the axiom of choice for non-constructivity is actually a mistake—it is the appeal to PEM, LPO, or similar absolute principles applied to objects other than the finite which prevent proof from being thoroughly algorithmic. Some constructive mathematicians adopt various weakenings of AC which are (perhaps) less contentious; Brouwer, as we saw in Section 2, adopts Continuous Choice.

c. Foundations & Advances

Bishop's view is that the Gödel interpretation of logical symbols accurately describes numerical meaning (Bishop, 1970). This view does not appear to have retained much traction with practitioners of BISH (Beeson, 1985, p. 49). Leaving the question of foundations open is, as mentioned, partly responsible for the portability of Bishop-style proofs.

Some work has been done on founding BISH. A set-theoretic approach was proposed in Myhill (1975) and Friedman (1977); Feferman (1979) suggested an approach based on classes and operations. Yet another approach is Martin-Löf's theory of types, which we visit in Section 5.

The Techniques of Constructive Analysis book (Bridges & Vîta, 2006) develops a Bishop-style constructive mathematics that revisits and extends the work from Bishop (1967) in a more modern setting, showing how modern proof techniques from advanced topics such as Hilbert spaces and operator theory can be successfully covered constructively. It is interesting to observe that, as a rule of thumb, the more ingenious a proof looks, the less explicit numerical content it tends to contain. Thus such proofs are usually more difficult to translate into constructive proofs. Of course there are exceptions, but the comparison between (say) Robinson's nonstandard analysis and Bishop's constructive methods appears to be a confusion between elegance and content propagated by some authors; see, for example, Stewart (1986) and Richman (1987).

5. Martin-Löf Type Theory

In 1968, Per Martin-Löf published his Notes on Constructive Mathematics (Martin-Löf, 1968). It encapsulates mathematics based on recursive function theory, with a background of the algorithms of Post (1936).

However he soon revisited foundations in a different way, which harks back to Russell's type theory, albeit using a more constructive and less logicist approach. The basic idea of Martin-Löf's theory of types (Martin-Löf, 1975) is that mathematical objects all come as types, and are always given in terms of a type (for example, one such type is that of functions from natural numbers to natural numbers), due to an intuitive understanding that we have of the notion of the given type.

The central distinction Martin-Löf makes is that between proof and derivation. Derivations convince us of the truth of a statement, whereas a proof contains the data necessary for computational (that is, mechanical) verification of a proposition. Thus what one finds in standard mathematical textbooks are derivations; a proof is a kind of realizability (c.f. Kleene, 1945) and links mathematics to implementation (at least implicitly).

The theory is very reminiscent of a kind of cumulative hierarchy. Propositions can be represented as types (a proposition's type is the type of its proofs), and to each type one may associate a proposition (that the associated type is not empty). One then builds further types by construction on already existing types.

a. The Axiom of Choice is provable

Within Martin-Löf type theory, the axiom of choice, stated symbolically as


is derivable. Recall that this would be inconsistent, if AC were interpreted classically. However the axiom is derivable because in the construction of types, the construction of an element of a set (type) is sufficient to prove its membership. In Bishop-style constructive mathematics, these sets are "completely presented", in that we need to know no more than an object's construction to determine its set membership. Under the BHK interpretation, the added requirement on the proof of xAP(x) that the algorithm may depend also on the data that x belongs to A and not just on the construction of x itself is thus automatically satisfied.

It is worth noting that sets construed in this theory are constrained by this realizability criterion. For example, in Martin-Löf's theory, the power set axiom is not accepted in full generality—the power set of N, for example, is considered to be what would in classical theory be called a class, but not a set (Martin-Löf, 1975).

6. Constructive Reverse Mathematics

The program of Reverse Mathematics, instigated by Harvey Friedman (1975), aims to classify theorems according to their equivalence to various set-theoretic principles. The constructive equivalent was begun in a systematic manner by Ishihara (2006) and, separately and independently by W. Veldman in 2005.

The field has since had numerous developments, the interest of which lies mainly in the metamathematical comparison of different branches of constructive mathematics and the logical strengths of various principles endorsed or rejected by the different schools. This also points to the requirements on computational data for various properties to hold, such as various notions of compactness (Diener, 2008).

Principles whose classification is of interest include:

  • The Uniform Continuity Theorem (UCT): Every pointwise continuous mapping of the closed interval [0,1] into R is uniformly continuous.
  • Brouwer's fan theorem, and various weakenings thereof. (There is actually a hierarchy of fan theorems; see, for example, Diener, 2008.)
  • The Anti-Specker property (AS): A sequence (zn)n1 of real numbers in [0,1] that is eventually bounded away from each point of [0,1] is eventually bounded away from all of [0,1] (recall the discussion in Section 3a).
  • Omniscience principles.

It should be noted that arguably the first author dealing with reverse-mathematical ideas was Brouwer, although he certainly would not have seen it as such. The weak counterexamples (see Section 2a) he introduced were of the form: P implies some non-constructive principle. Though Brouwer may have been aware of the possibility of reversing the implication in many cases, to him non-constructive principles were meaningless and as such the full equivalence result would be of little interest.

7. Summary

The philosophical commitments of constructivist philosophies (Section 1b) are:

  • Truth is replaced by (algorithmic) proof as a primitive notion, and
  • Existence means constructibility.

This naturally leads to intuitionistic logic, characterized by the BHK interpretation (Section 1c). Omniscience principles, such as the Principle of Excluded Middle (PEM), and any mode of argument which validates such principles, are not in general valid under this interpretation, and the classical equivalence between the logical connectives does not hold.

Constructive proofs of classical theorems are often enlightening: the computational content of the hypotheses is explicitly seen to produce the conclusion. While intuitionistic logic places restrictions on inferences, the larger part of classical mathematics (or what is classically equivalent) can be recovered using only constructive methods (Section 4); there are often several constructively different versions of the same classical theorem.

The computational advantage of constructive proof is borne out in two ways. Constructive proofs:

  • embody (in principle) an algorithm (for computing objects, converting other algorithms, etc.), and
  • prove that the algorithm they embody is correct (that is, that it meets its design specification).

The programme of constructive reverse mathematics (Section 6) connects various principles and theorems (such as omniscience principles, versions of the fan theorem, etc.), shedding light on constructive or computational requirements of theorems. Furthermore, the use of Brouwerian counterexamples (Section 2a) often allows the mathematician to distinguish which aspects of classical proof are essentially nonconstructive.

Throught the article, several schools of constructivism are outlined. Each is essentially mathematics with intuitionistic logic, philosophical differences notwithstanding. Different schools add different further axioms: for example, (Russian) constructive recursive mathematics (Section 3) is mathematics with intuitionistic logic, the computable partial functions axiom (and Markov's principle of unbounded search). Classical mathematics can be interpreted as Bishop's constructive mathematics, with PEM added.

a. Some Further Remarks

The contrast between classical and constructive mathematicians is clear: in order to obtain the numerical content of a proof, the classical mathematician must be careful at each step of the proof to avoid decisions that cannot be algorithmically made; whereas the constructive mathematician, in adopting intuitionistic logic, has automatically dealt with the computational content carefully enough that an algorithm may be extracted from their proof.

In an age where computers are ubiquitous, the constructivist programme needs even less (pragmatic) justification, perhaps, than the classical approach. This is borne out by the successful translation of constructive proofs into actual algorithms (see, for example, Schwichtenberg (2009) and Berger, Berghofer, Letouzey & Schwichtenberg (2006)). The link between programming and abstract mathematics is stronger than ever, and will only strengthen as new research emerges.

8. References and Further reading

a. Further Reading

An overview of constructivism in mathematics is given in both Troelstra & van Dalen (1988), and Beeson (1985). For further reading in intuitionism from a philosophical perspective, Dummett's Elements (1977) is the prime resource. The Bishop and Bridges book (1985) is the cornerstone textbook for the Bishop-style constructivist. For the finitist version, see Ye (2011), where it is shown that even a strict finitist interpretation allows large tracts of constructive mathematics to be realized; in particular we see application to finite things of Lebesgue integration, and extension of the constructive theory to semi-Riemannian geometry. For advances and techniques in Bishop-style mathematics, see Bridges & Vîta (2006). For an introduction to constructive recursive function theory, see Richman (1983); Bridges & Richman (1987) expounds the theory relative to other kinds of constructive mathematics. For an introduction to computable analysis, see, for example, Weihrauch (2000). For topology, Bridges & Vîta (2011) outlays a Bishop-style development of topology; Sambin (1987) and (2003) are good starting points for further reading in the recent development of point-free (or formal) topology.

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Author Information

Maarten McKubre-Jordens
University of Canterbury
New Zealand