Moral Particularism

Moral particularism is the view that the moral status of an action is not in any way determined by moral principles; rather, it depends on the configuration of the morally relevant features of the action in a particular context. It can be seen as a reaction against a traditional principled conception of morality as comprising a true and coherent set of moral principles. The chief motivation for moral particularism derives from the observation that exceptions to principles are common, and exceptions to exceptions are not unusual. Moral principles, which are equipped only to deal with homogeneous cases, seem to be too crude to handle the delicate nuances in heterogeneous moral situations.

Two counterarguments against moral particularism have been popular. One is the argument from supervenience. The other is the argument from the atomism of reason. The argument from supervenience is meant to establish the existence of true absolute moral principles, whereas the argument from the atomism of reason is meant to establish the existence of true, pro tanto, moral principles. If these arguments succeed, they will jointly consolidate a principled conception of morality. This article introduces the idea of moral particularism in more detail and assesses moral particularists’ responses to the two counterarguments mentioned above.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Absolute Moral Principlism and the Supervenience Argument
  3. Moral Particularists’ Responses to the Supervenience Argument
  4. Argument from Atomism of Reason for Pro tanto Principlism
  5. Criticism of Argument from Atomism of Reason
  6. Concluding Remarks
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Moral particularism, on a first approximation, is the view that the moral status of an action is not in any way determined by moral principles; rather, it depends on the configuration of the morally relevant features of the action in a particular context. To illustrate, whether killing is morally wrong is not determined by whether it violates any sort of universal moral principles, say, the moral principle against killing; rather, its moral status is determined by its morally relevant features in the particular context where it occurs. If it occurs in a normal context, it is wrong; however, if it occurs in a context where the killer kills because it is the only way to defend from a rascal’s fatal attack, it is not wrong. In this case, the moral principle against killing does not determine the moral status of the action; rather, its moral status is determined by its morally relevant features, that is, the feature of killing an aggressor and the feature of saving one’s own life, in the particular context. Now, let us call those who contend, contra moral particularists, that the moral status of an action is determined by moral principles the ‘moral principlists’. In the killing case, the moral principlists might well contend that the principle against killing is not the right sort of principle but the principle which says that ‘killing is wrong except it is done out of self-defense’ is. So still the moral principlists might contend that it is the principle that determines the moral status of the action. However, according to moral particularism, even in cases where the moral verdicts issued respectively by moral principles and particular features converge, it is still the particular features rather than universal principles that determine the moral status of an action. This is not to say that the moral particularists are right to think so; this merely illustrates the difference between the views of moral particularists and principlists. The gist of moral particularism is best summed up in the words of Terence Irwin (2000): the particulars are normatively prior to the universals.

To further illustrate the differences between moral particularism and principlism, moral particularism can be seen as a reaction against a top-down principled approach to morality. That is, it opposes the moral principlists’ idea that we can get morally right answers by applying universal moral principles to particular situations.

In more detail, in moral principlists’ conception of morality, morality is made up of a true and coherent set of moral principles. It follows from this conception that if one negates the existence of moral principles, one negates morality altogether. For without moral principles, it seems that there would be no standards against which the moral status of actions can be determined.

The above-mentioned principlists’ conception of morality has been, without a doubt, a dominant view. This can be confirmed by examining the work in normative ethics. One chief concern of normative ethics has been to formulate basic moral principles that govern the moral terrain. It is generally believed by the normative ethicists that in basic moral principles lies the ultimate source of moral truths. The normative ethicists, though arguing among themselves over what the correct basic moral principles are, all tacitly agree that a major part of normative ethics is built upon the articulation of the basic moral principles and their application to practical moral issues.

While the debate amongst normative ethicists is continuing about the correct formulation and application of the basic moral principle(s), the common principled conception of morality underlying it has not received proper attention—not until the appearance of the contemporary particularists.

Contrary to the principlists, the particularists argue that morality does not depend upon codification into a true and coherent set of moral principles. On their view, general principles fail to capture the complexity and uniqueness of particular circumstances. Exceptions to principles are common and exceptions to exceptions are not unusual (Davis 2004; Tsu 2010). In other words, there are no exceptionless principles of the sort which the principlists have in mind. The particularists believe that the moral status of an action is not determined by moral principles; instead it always relies on the particular configuration of its contextual features. In brief, moral particularists take a bottom-up approach and, as Irwin pointed out, they give the normative priorities to the particulars. That is, according to moral particularism, the moral status of an action is determined by its morally relevant features in a particular context.

More slowly, one chief motivation for moral particularism to place emphasis on the particulars comes from their observation that the whole history of moral philosophy has witnessed brilliant moral philosophers searching for true moral principles that codify the moral landscape, yet no principles have generated wide agreement. There can be many explanations for this, but one is particularly salient: there are no true moral principles to be had in the first place. Parallel situations like this are common in many corners of philosophy. Many brilliant philosophers have spent their whole life’s time analyzing concepts of probability, truth or knowledge, trying to supply non-trivial, non-circular necessary and sufficient conditions for them. As is generally acknowledged today, it is extremely difficult, if not entirely impossible, to come up with a widely accepted analysis. One plausible explanation is that no analysis of the kind is to be had in the first place. This is not to say that there cannot be alternative explanations. But until they are produced and justified, there is at least a prima facie case for doubting whether conceptual analysis can produce non-trivial, non-circular necessary and sufficient conditions for the meanings of many philosophically interesting terms. Likewise, as hardly any moral principle receives wide acceptance, there is also a prima facie case that can be made for doubting whether there are any true moral principles in the first place, until an alternative explanation of why agreement on principles is so hard to come by is produced and justified.

Adding to the untenability of the principled conception of morality, moral particularists argue, is the fact that the moral status of an action is context-sensitive in character. That is, whether an action is right or wrong depends entirely on the particular contexts where it takes place; no universal principles, which are only equipped to deal with homogeneous cases, are capable of capturing the context-sensitive character of the moral status of an action in various heterogeneous contexts. Take the action of killing for instance. A principle against killing will run into exceptions in cases of self-defense and a further qualified principle against killing except in cases of self-defense will run into exceptions again in cases of overreacting self-defense. The exceptions may well go on infinitely. This shows that, the moral particularists believe, no principles are able to handle the essentially context-sensitive character of the moral status of an action.

To forestall some possible misunderstanding, moral particularism is not just the view that the moral status of an action is not determined by moral principles of the absolute kind – the absolute moral principle against killing; rather, it is the more encompassing and more radical view that it is not determined by moral principles of the pro tanto kind either. The difference between absolute moral principles and pro tanto ones roughly lies in the fact that the former purport to determine the moral status of an action conclusively, whereas the later do not; instead, the pro tanto moral principles, on a standard construal, merely specify the contribution a morally relevant feature makes to the determination of the moral status of an action. To use an example to illustrate, the difference between an absolute principle against lying and a pro tanto principle against lying lies in the fact that according to the absolute principle, lying is wrong (period) whereas according to the pro tanto principle, lying is wrong-making. To put it differently, according to the absolute principle against lying, the fact that an action has a feature of lying conclusively determines its wrongness whereas according to the pro tanto principle against lying, the same fact merely contributes to the wrongness of the action and leaves open the possibility that it is right overall. For instance, if an action has not only a feature of lying, but also a feature of saving a life, then the wrongness the feature of lying contributes to the action may well be outweighed by the rightness the feature of saving a life contributes to the action. Overall, the action may still turn out to be right, despite its violation of the pro tanto principle against lying.

Moral particularism, as we have explained, not only opposes absolute principlism, i.e. the idea that the moral status of an action is determined by absolute principles, but also pro tanto principlism, i.e. the idea that pro tanto moral principles jointly determine the moral status of an action. As moral particularists see things, there are neither true absolute principles nor true pro tanto principles. They both are bound to run into exceptions in some cases. In what follows, we will introduce the arguments for absolute moral principlism and pro tanto principlism and moral particularists’ responses to them.

Before we move on, however, there is an important caveat to be noted about terminology. It is this. Some philosophers use ‘prima facie principles’ to mean pro tanto principles. This is largely due to W. D. Ross’s influence. Ross was perhaps the first philosopher who used ‘prima facie’ to mean ‘pro tanto’. Strictly speaking, however, there is a difference in the meanings of these two phrases, as Ross himself later recognized and apologized. The difference between ‘prima facie’ and ‘pro tanto’ principles can be put in the following way: a prima facie principle specifies a moral duty at first glance whereas a pro tanto principle specifies a moral duty sans phrase, unless it is overridden by other moral duties. To illustrate with examples, a pro tanto principle against lying means that other things being equal, we have a duty not to lie. By contrast, a prima facie principle against lying means that at first glance, we have a duty not to lie; however, as we take a closer examination of the facts of the situations, we discover that we do not in fact have such a duty, as, for example, in the case where we are playing a bluffing game, the rule of which states that lying to the other contestants is permitted.

Now, having clarified the distinction between ‘pro tanto principle’ and ‘prima facie principle’, it has to be noted, for our purposes, that pro tanto principlism is the view that the moral status of an action is determined jointly by pro tanto principles, instead of by prima facie principles we just elucidated. In fact, the prima facie principles do not in any way determine the moral status of an action, for as we have explained, they are merely indicative of its moral status (as our moral duty) at first glance.

With the above caveat in mind, we can proceed to examine the arguments for absolute moral principlism and pro tanto principlism, and moral particularists’ responses to them.

2. Absolute Moral Principlism and the Supervenience Argument

Absolute moral principlism  is the idea that there are true absolute moral principles. The most powerful argument that has been advanced in support of this idea is the supervenience argument. It was advanced collaboratively by Frank Jackson, Philip Pettit, and Michael Smith (henceforth the Canberrans, as they all worked in Canberra in Australia when they advanced the argument) in their co-authored paper “Ethical Particularism and Patterns”. Roughly, the supervenience argument takes the following form:

P1: The thesis of global supervenience is true.

P2: If the thesis of global supervenience is true, then there must be a true conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’.

P3: The true conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’ must be shaped.

P4: A true shaped conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’ is a true absolute moral principle.

C: There are true absolute moral principles, that is absolute moral principlism is true.

The above argument is valid, but each premise needs some comment.

P1: The thesis of global supervenience is true.

The thesis of global supervenience means, according to the Canberrans, the following:

The thesis of global supervenience: Naturally identical worlds are morally identical.

To illustrate, suppose that N1 stands for the sum of natural properties of world 1 and M1 for the sum of its moral properties. According to the thesis of global supervenience, for any world that is naturally identical with world 1, that is for any world that has N1, it must have M1. The Canberrans take the global thesis to be true, for it is a dictum in the realm of ethics that there cannot be a moral difference without a natural difference. So it follows from this dictum that naturally identical worlds are morally identical.

P2: If the thesis of global supervenience is true, then there must be a true conditional of the form ‘(x) (NxMx)’.

Suppose again that N1 stands for the sum of natural properties of world 1 and M1 for the sum of its moral properties. As we have illustrated, according to the thesis of global supervenience, for any world that is naturally identical with world 1, that is for any world that has N1, it must have M1. Likewise, let N2 and M2 stand respectively for the sum of natural properties of world 2 and the sum of its moral properties. According to the thesis of global supervenience, for any world that is naturally identical with world 2, it must have M2. Such being the case, from the thesis of global supervenience we can get the following raft of conditionals:

If x has N1, then x has M1.

If x has N2, then x has M2.

For the sake of simplicity, let us focus on the moral property of rightness and use ‘M’ for it, and use ‘N’ for ‘N1 or N2 or N3…’. Now, we can simplify the above raft of conditionals as follows:

If x has N, then x has M.

Hence, we can infer from the thesis of global supervenience that there must be a true conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’.

P3: The true conditional of the form ‘(x) (NxMx)’ must be shaped.

The meaning of ‘shaped’ requires some explanation. According to the Canberrans, a conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’ is shaped if and only if there is some commonality in the various Ns ‘N’ refers to. Remember that ‘N’ stands for ‘N1 or N2 or N3…’. So this just means that a conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’ is shaped if and only if there is some commonality amongst N1, N2, N3... Having clarified the meaning of ‘shaped’, one question that needs to be addressed here is why there must be some commonality amongst N1, N2, N3…

The Canberrans contend that there must be some commonality amongst the various Ns, for if there were not, an absurd consequence would follow. The absurd consequence is this: we are not competent with the use of moral terms. This is absurd because we are indeed competent with the use of moral terms. We condemn a cold-blooded case of murder as immoral whereas we approve of an act of self-sacrifice as virtuous. It is absurd to suggest that we are not competent with the use of moral terms. Let’s call this absurd consequence conceptual incompetence for short. So how is it the case that if there were no commonality amongst the various Ns, conceptual incompetence would follow? Or to put the question somewhat differently, why is commonality in the various Ns essential for our competence with the use of moral terms?

To answer this question, let us use an example to illustrate. According to the Canberrans, the moral term ‘M’ (or ‘right’ in our current case) applies to various actions that have Ns. These actions that have Ns can be infinite in number. In order to know that ‘M’ can be applied to these various actions that have Ns, we, as finite human beings, cannot possibly acquaint ourselves with each and all of the actions that have Ns which ‘M’ applies to. That is to say, we cannot become competent with the use of ‘M’ by acquainting ourselves with all the possible actions ‘M’ applies to. The only viable way via which we can become competent with the use of ‘M’ is when these various actions have some finite commonality we can latch on to. Once we latch on to that commonality, we become competent with the use of ‘M’. So, the fact that we are indeed competent with the use of ‘M’ shows that there must be some commonality amongst the various Ns.

P4: A true shaped conditional of the form ‘(x) (NxMx)’ is a true absolute moral principle.

This premise is by definition true, as the Canberrans contend that a true absolute moral principle is one that displays a shaped connection between the natural ways things might be and the moral ways things might be. Suppose that ‘N’ stands for the natural property of maximal utility and ‘M’ for the moral property of rightness. Then the true shaped conditional of the form ‘(x) (Nx → Mx)’ just says that an action that has maximal utility is right. This is clearly equivalent to a true absolute moral principle of utility.

C: There are true absolute moral principles, that is absolute moral principlism is true).

C follows validly from P1 to P4. If there are true absolute moral principles, this just means that absolute moral principlism is true. Besides, this also means that moral particularism, the claim that there are neither true absolute moral principles nor true pro tanto moral principles will be refuted.

3. Moral Particularists’ Responses to the Supervenience Argument

In section 2, we have examined Canberrans’ supervenience argument for moral absolute principlism, or against moral particularism. Now, in this section, we will examine moral particularists’ response to Canberrans’ supervenience argument. Much of the philosophical action has focused on P3, especially on ‘conceptual incompetence’. This is understandable, as all the other premises seem to be relatively uncontroversial. So now, without further detain, let us just cut to the chase and introduce moral particularists’ response to P3. Jonathan Dancy (1999a, 2004), a chief proponent of moral particularism, responds to the supervenience argument by taking issue with P3. He contends that the Canberrans have not provided us with very convincing reasons to believe that P3 is true. In particular, Dancy argues that the Canberrans’ claim with regard to ‘conceptual incompetence’ is far from being justified.

As a reminder, P3 is the claim that the true conditional of the form ‘(x)

(Nx → Mx)’ must be shaped. As we have explained, the meaning of a ‘shaped’

conditional boils down to this: there is some commonality in the various Ns. And the Canberrans contend that if there were no commonality in the

various Ns, then the absurd consequence of ‘conceptual incompetence’ would

result, that is the absurd consequence that we are not competent with the use of

moral terms.

Remember that the Canberrans’ reason for thinking that ‘conceptual

incompetence’ would result is this. The Canberrans argue that the only plausible way for us to learn a moral term is by latching onto a commonality that the various actions that have Ns have in common, for we, as finite beings, cannot possibly acquaint ourselves with all the various actions that have Ns which the moral term can be applied to. So if there were no commonality amongst the various actions that have Ns, then it would be impossible for us to become competent with the use of moral terms.

However, Dancy maintains that Canberrans’ line of reasoning is a non sequitur. He argues that we can become competent with the use of moral terms even if there is no commonality amongst the various actions that have Ns. For there is one theory of competence the Canberrans unduly neglected, that is, the prototype theory, which is firstly advanced by Rosch (1975). According to the prototype theory, there is no commonality amongst the various Ns the moral term ‘right’ can be applied to; we do not latch unto the commonality amongst various Ns when we learn the term ‘right’ since there is none. Instead, what we latch unto are the ‘prototypical properties’ of a right action, that is the properties that are typical of a right action.

To use an analogy to illustrate, the various things the concept ‘bird’ can be applied to really have no commonality. It is true that birds can typically fly. However, a penguin cannot fly. It is also true that birds typically have feathers. Nonetheless, some baby birds do not. So there is really no commonality all birds have in common. Does this mean that we are thus unable to learn how to use the term ‘bird’? No! For we are indeed competent with the use of the term ‘bird’. So how do we pick up the term ‘bird’ if there is really no commonality amongst the various birds? According to the prototype theory, what we pick up are the prototypical properties that are typical of a bird—for instance, its capability of flying, its having feathers, and its having wings, et cetera. With regard to the atypical cases, such as those of penguins and baby birds, we can rightly categorize them as birds because they have enough of those prototypical properties that are typical of a bird. Likewise, Dancy contends that in the moral cases, we can become competent with the use of moral terms, say, the term ‘right’, by picking up those prototypical properties that are typical of right actions. With regard to the atypical cases, we can rightly categorize them as right actions because they have enough of those prototypical properties that are typical of right actions just as we can rightly categorize penguins and baby birds as birds because they have enough of those prototypical properties that are typical of birds.

So far, we have seen Dancy’s response to the ‘conceptual incompetence’ claim that is used to support P3 in the supervenience argument. Whether Dancy’s response is successful is an issue that requires further investigation. The crux of the question lies in whether the term ‘right’ is really analogous to the term ‘bird’ with regard to the lack of commonality amongst the things they can be applied to. The use of analogy, while illuminating, does not seem to prove that the term ‘right’ is really analogous to the term ‘bird’ in that aspect. To put it somewhat differently, is there any good reason to think that the prototype theory that can be used to explain our competence with the term ‘bird’ can explain equally well our competence with the term ‘right’? Perhaps a natural response from the moral particularists would be to say that the morally right actions are multiply realizable at the natural level—even killing, stealing, and lying can be morally right in some circumstances, and if so, it seems plausible to contend that these morally right actions do not seem to have anything in common with other morally right ones such as saving a drowning kid in the pond or donating to Oxfam. This is one of the possible responses that can be made. As to exactly how plausible it is and whether there are other more plausible responses await further exploration. These issues will not be pursed here.

4. Argument from Atomism of Reason for Pro tanto Principlism

In sections 2 and 3, we have examined respectively the supervenience argument that purports to establish the truth of absolute principlism and moral particularist’s response to it. Now, remember that moral particularism does not just hold the view that absolute principlism is false, but also the view that pro tanto principlism is false. Now, if there are good arguments to show that pro tanto principlism is true, then moral particularism will be falsified.

Remember that pro tanto principlism is the claim that there are true pro tanto moral principles. Pro tanto moral principles specify a feature of an action that is either right-making or wrong-making. For instance, the pro tanto principle against lying specifies the feature of lying as a wrong-making feature whereas the pro tanto principle demanding promise-keeping specifies the feature of promise-keeping as right-making. The strongest argument that has been advanced to support pro tanto principlism is the argument from the atomism of reason. It runs as follows:

P1. The atomism of reason is true.

P2. If the atomism of reason is true, then there are true pro tanto moral


C. There are true pro tanto moral principles

The above argument is valid. But in the meantime, each premise needs some comments.

P1: The atomism of reason is true.

In its simplest form, the atomism of reason is the idea that features of an action, qua reasons, behave in an atomistic way. The atomism of reason is contrasted with holism of reason, the view that features of an action, qua reasons, behave in a holistic way. To grasp the difference between atomism and holism, it is of course necessary for us to understand what ‘atomistic way’ and ‘holistic way’ mean. According to atomism, features, qua reasons, behave in an atomistic way in the sense that their status as reasons for or against performing an action is constant, insusceptible to the change of contexts. It is as if they had an intrinsic nature that remains constant across contexts. Hence, the analogy to ‘atom’. To illustrate, according to atomism of reason, if a feature of lying is a reason against performing the action in one context, its status as a reason against remains constant; even in a context where you have to lie in order to save a life, the feature of lying still remains as a reason against performing the action. Its status as a reason against does not change, although its moral significance might well be outweighed by that of saving a life.

On the other hand, holism contends that features, qua reasons, behave in a holistic way in the sense that their status as reasons for or against might change due to the change of contexts. For instance, the fact that an action has a feature of lying might be a reason against performing it in a normal context; however, it might not be so in a context where we are playing a bluffing game. Indeed, it might even become a reason for performing the action because it makes the game more exciting and enjoyable.

In face of the challenges from the holists, there are typically three routes the atomists take to respond. First, the atomists might well bite the bullet and contend that the feature of lying is a reason against no matter what. In the context of playing a bluffing game, the atomists might well contend that the fact that bluffing has a feature of lying is still a reason against so doing; it is just that its moral significance is outweighed by that of the harmless pleasures of the participants. That is why bluffing seems overall morally permissible in that context. However, this does not mean that the status of the feature of lying as a reason has changed from a reason against to a reason for in that context.

Another response from the atomists is this. The features that change their reason status are overly simplified. The more the features get specified, the less compelling the case is that they can change their reason status. For instance, the feature of killing might change its status from a reason against in a normal context to a reason for in a context where the only possible way to defend oneself against a rapist is to kill him. However, when the feature of killing gets more specified as the feature of killing a little girl merely for one’s own pleasure, it does not seem likely that its status as a reason against can change.

A third line of response from the atomists is this. There are two sorts of features we need to distinguish in the current context: the morally thin and the morally thick. The difference between the thin and the thick, according to Crisp (2000), lies chiefly in whether they are couched in virtue terms. For instance, the features of lying and killing belong to the thin whereas the features of honesty and cruelty belong to the thick. They also differ in the way they behave. While the morally thin might change their reason status according to contexts, the morally thick don’t. For instance, while it might well be the case that the feature of lying might change its status from a reason against to a reason for, it is never the case for the feature of dishonesty. The feature of dishonesty is always a reason against. To think otherwise is to distort the meaning of ‘dishonesty’. In fact, according to Crisp, the invariant reason status of the feature of dishonesty is the best explanation for the variance of reason status of lying. In cases where lying brings about dishonesty, it is a reason against, whereas in cases where it does not, it is not a reason against. To put it more generally, the invariant reason status of the morally thick provides an illuminating explanation for why the morally thin change their reason status. So the atomists contend that it is both linguistically intuitive and explanatorily illuminating to regard the morally thick as invariant reasons. Such being the case, the atomists contend that while holism might be true of the morally thin, it is not true of the morally thick.

P2. If the atomism of reason is true, then there are true pro tanto moral principles.

The atomism of reason is the claim that features, qua reasons, behave in an atomistic way. As we have explained, this means that their reason status does not change according to contexts. If a feature of lying is a reason against in one context, it is a reason against in all contexts. If so, this just means that there is (always) a reason against lying. On the other hand, according to the pro tanto moral principle against lying, the fact that an action has a feature of lying always is a reason against performing it. So if the atomism of reason about lying is true, it follows naturally that there is a true pro tanto moral principle against lying. The same line of reasoning can be generalized to apply to other features as well.

5. Criticism of Argument from Atomism of Reason

P1 in the argument from the atomism of reason is where all the philosophical action is. In section 3, we have seen the atomists’ three possible replies to the particularists’ holism charge against P1. However, the particularists are not thus satisfied. In what follows, I will introduce respectively particularists’ further challenges to the atomists’ three replies.

First, the atomists contend that the atomism is simply true of how all features qua reasons behave. Even in cases where we are playing a bluffing game, the feature of lying is still a reason against but not a reason for. It does not thus change its reason status. Against this line of reasoning, the particularists might well contend that the atomists’ point is simply question-begging. For whether atomism is true of how all features qua reasons behave is exactly the issue disputed. The atomists’ assertion is no substitute for persuasion.

Second, the atomists contend that when the features get more and more specified, it is less and less likely that their reason status can change. For instance, while it might be possible for a feature of killing to change its reason status from a reason against to a reason for, it seems very unlikely for a more specified feature of killing, the feature of killing a little girl merely for fun, to change its reason status. In reply, the particularists might well contend that while the specified feature of killing a little girl merely for fun cannot change its moral status, it does not thus establish a pro tanto moral principle in the relevant sense. For the ‘merely for fun’ bit is a description of the agent’s motive, whereas a pro tanto principle is exclusively about the moral status of actions. When the controversial bit of the description of the feature is eliminated, it no longer seems as intuitively plausible to maintain that the feature of killing a little girl is always a reason against, for doing so might eliminate her needless suffering as a terminally ill patient and serves as a reason for. Against this line of reasoning, the atomists might well contend that the ‘merely for fun’ bit is added to the description only to prevent other principles from getting involved (for instance, the girl is not being killed as demanded by some other principle, where doing so is necessary to save a large number of girls) and that the specified feature can thus establish the truth of a pro tanto principle in the relevant sense. If the atomists were to so contend, the particularists might counter, as Dancy (2000) did, that true moral principles generated out of specified features like this are far and few between in the moral landscape. So while the atomists might have won a few battles against the particularists by producing a few true moral principles based on specified features, they certainly have not won the war. For morality, for the larger part, still cannot be codified into exceptionless moral principles and does not depend on them for its existence, the particularists might insist.

Finally, the atomists contend that atomism is true of the morally thick, the features that are couched in virtue terms, such as honesty or cruelty. In reply, the particularists might well contend that this is not necessarily the case. A spy might well be too honest whereas a platoon leader relentless in training his soldiers who are about to be sent to the battlefields might well be only cruel to be kind. In these cases, the feature of honesty might well change its reason status from a reason for to a reason against whereas the feature of cruelty might well do the reverse. In short, the morally thick, contra what the atomists claim, might well change their reason status. And calling someone ‘too honest’ or ‘cruel to be kind’ does not really run counter to our linguistic intuitions. On the other hand, with regard to the explanation of why a morally thin feature such as that of lying changes its reason status, the holists are not completely clueless as the atomists like to think. In fact, they might well appeal to the change of the context as providing an explanation. For instance, the holists might well contend that the reason why a feature of lying which is normally a reason against becomes a reason for in the context of playing a bluffing game is because of the change of the context. The atomists do not have any theoretical edge in terms of providing an explanation for why the morally thin can change their reason status.

6. Concluding Remarks

Moral particularism, as we have introduced it, is the view that the particulars are normatively prior to the universals. That is, the moral status of an action is not in any way determined by universal moral principles, but by the morally relevant features in a particular context where the action takes place. This view is motivated by the observation that universal principles, no matter whether they are absolute or pro tanto, often run into exceptions. This observation has led moral particularists to believe that the moral status of an action is context-sensitive, susceptible to the influences of various morally relevant factors in the particular circumstances. And as both absolute moral principles and pro tanto ones deal in the same sort of moral answer in all contexts they cover, moral particularists believe that they oversimplify the moral matter. The moral principles, be they absolute or pro tanto, fly in the face of the context-sensitivity of the moral status of an action. Moral particularists therefore contend that there are neither true absolute moral principles nor true pro tanto ones,

As we have seen, two major arguments against moral particularism have been advanced respectively by absolute moral principlists and pro tanto moral principlists. However, as we have also seen, they are far from being conclusive. P3 in the supervenience argument and P1 in the argument from the atomism of reason can both be disputed. Of course, this does not mean that there can never be compelling arguments against moral particularism. In fact, there are several outstanding issues remaining for moral particularism. Roughly, they all point to the fact that moral particularism has not really undermined a principled conception of morality, when the idea of a moral principle is construed in various specific ways. For instance, Holton (2002) has argued that the gist of moral particularism is entirely compatible with the existence of what he calls ‘that’s-it principle’. Ridge and McKeever (2006), on the other hand, propose to view moral principles as ‘regulative ideals’ and argue that this view of moral principles is not scathed by any particularist argument that has been advanced so far. Moreover, Väyrynen (2006) champions the notion of ‘hedged moral principles’ and argues that they might well play an indispensable role in action guidance. Finally, Robinson (2006) has urged a dispositionalist understanding of moral principles; when moral principles are so understood, Robinson contends that they are immune from the particularists’ attacks. We cannot afford to pursue the details of the above-mentioned proposals here. To determine whether they are successful or not lies beyond the scope of the current article. However, they all provide interesting topics for future research. It is fair to say that debates on moral particularism are still very lively. They cut deep into the nature of morality. This article has barely begun to scratch the surface.

7. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Peter Shiu-Hwa Tsu
Taipei Medical University
Republic of China

Ethics and Care-Worker Migration

Cited as one of the most pressing issues of our times, health care worker migration is now occurring at unprecedented rates. In the post-colonial era, as many developing countries began to develop and expand their health services and to educate their citizens to staff them, more educated workers left for wealthier countries, often those of the colonists or ones that shared the colonists’ language and other cultural ties.

Health worker migration has seen more than one phase, and taken on many forms. The transnational flow, however—especially from low and middle-income countries to wealthier ones—has never been higher. Of particular concern is asymmetrical migration – the main focus of this article – because it is skewing the distribution of the global health workforce and contributing to severe shortages in some parts of the world. There are also concerns about health worker distribution between urban and rural areas, between the public and private health care sectors, and among fields of specialization, but these will not be discussed here. Because many so-called “source countries” have higher burdens of disease and suffer from lower health care worker-to-population ratios than do destination countries, asymmetrical migration is deepening health inequities and creating what many have described as a global crisis in health.

This article begins by identifying a range of factors that contribute to the movement of health care workers around the globe, specifically from low and middle-income countries to affluent ones.  From there it explores ethical issues that arise concerning the deepening of global health inequalities; the status and treatment of migrant health workers, the implications for their families and communities; and the structure of human health resource planning. There is further consideration of the range of agents who might be said to have responsibilities to address these concerns, and what could be said to ground them. Noted are key efforts made to date as well as ideas for further reform.

Although this article refers to both migrants and emigrants, it is primarily emigrants – those who leave one country and take up residence in another – who are the main concern here. Additionally, the focus will be on nurses and care workers, such as nurse aides and home care aides. These health care workers tend to receive less attention than physicians, yet comprise a substantial share of migrant health care labor, in large part to meet the growing demands and expectations for affordable, quality long-term care services in high income countries. Moreover, the loss of nurses and other care workers is especially troubling for they tend to be the backbone of primary care in developing countries. This focus also highlights important issues concerning gender equity.

Table of Contents

  1. Care Workers on the Move: Contributing Factors
    1. Global Economic Policy
    2. Colonial Legacies
    3. Immigration Policies
    4. Health Care Policies
    5. The “Choices” of Privileged Families
    6. Care Regimes
  2. Ethical Issues
    1. Health Inequities in Source Countries
    2. Autonomy and Equity for Migrant Care Workers
    3. Social Reproduction and Political Capacity
  3. Responsibilities
    1. Responsibilities of Destination Countries
    2. Responsibilities of Other Agents
  4. Remedies
    1. Political and Institutional Strategies
    2. Compensation for Source Countries
    3. Retention Efforts in Source Countries
    4. Economic Policy Reform
    5. Health Policy Planning for the Long-term and Shared Governance for Health
    6. Practices of “Privileged Responsibility”
      1. Preventive Foresight
      2. Recognition
      3. Solidarity
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Care Workers on the Move: Contributing Factors

a. Global Economic Policy

Neo-liberal economic policies may be the greatest contributor to the contemporary movement of health care workers from low and middle to high-income countries. International financial institutions, chiefly the World Bank and International Monetary Fund (IMF), have aimed at making these countries more competitive players in the global marketplace. Their main tools, structural adjustment policies, have in many places led to reductions in health sector (and other) employment. Many people have thus been motivated to seek work in richer nations. Some countries, such as the Philippines and India, have also taken to recruiting and training their own citizens specifically for care work overseas (Yeates 2009). Intent on gaining a share of their remittances, this strategy has become an integral part of their economic development plans.

When asked why they migrate, Philippine-trained nurses, the largest group working abroad, give responses that reflect these background conditions (ILO 2006; Lorenzo, Galvez-Tan, Icamina et al., et al. 2007; Alonso-Garbayo and Maben 2009). They point to high and growing rates of unemployment and feelings of being “underutilized”, even when employed, because their skills often surpass what they can do for patients given the scarcity of available resources. At the same time, many are “overutilized” where staffing is short. These emigrant nurses identify desires for lower nurse to patient ratios, better working hours, higher salaries, and better opportunities for professional development and their families’ well-being. Some also describe familial pressure: given economic conditions and policies at home, working abroad has come increasingly to be seen as an expected strategy for family survival, even a woman’s duty (Kelly and D’Addario 2008; Nowak 2009). Certain forms of nationalist rhetoric, which I discuss below, may contribute to the pressures brought to bear.

b. Colonial Legacies

Even though the current rates of migration are unprecedented, in no small part due to global economic policy, nurses and other health care workers in many major source countries have long been primed for emigration. Missionary and military involvement in the Philippines, along with targeted foreign policy strategies, began fueling the mobility of Filipino nurses over a century ago (Choy 2003). As part of a broad effort to serve American colonists and military personnel stationed there with “modern” medicine, the Baptist Foreign Mission Society established the first nursing school in the country – the Iloilo Mission Hospital School of Nursing – in 1906. Many nurses were sent to the US for additional training, sponsored by groups like Rockefeller, Daughters of the American Revolution, and the Catholic Scholarship Fund. By the 1920s, efforts were well underway to export “American professionalism, standardization, and efficiency” in nursing education and practice – lauded as “rational, scientific, and universalistic” – to the Philippines (Brush 1995, 552). Later, in the wake of World War II, in collaboration with the International Council of Nurses, Rockefeller introduced the Exchange Visitor Program to offer experience in American hospitals for nurses trained abroad, including those from the Philippines. By the mid-1960s, most were moving to jobs in US hospitals.

Since these early days, the numbers leaving have grown exponentially (Cheng 2009). The contemporary surge can be traced to the export-oriented, debt-servicing development strategy established by President Ferdinand Marcos. By the late 1990s, a complex, labor-exporting bureaucracy had emerged. Cultivating this care labor and its export have been government-supported educational institutions that educate and train nurses, chiefly for foreign markets in Saudi Arabia, the US, and the UK. With major capital at stake, some governments have been “only too eager to provide this habitat [my emphasis]” for producing care workers, deemed most valuable as export (Tolentino 1996, 53).

As the example of the Philippines demonstrates, colonial histories figure prominently in the contemporary emigration of care workers. These longstanding “interdependent relationships…established over centuries” (Raghuram 2009, 30) contribute to the global flow of health care workers. In addition to those from the Philippines, Indian nurses now constitute one of the largest groups of emigrant health care workers (Kingma 2006; Khadria 2007; Hawkes, Kolenko, Shockness et al. 2009). Their modern-day migration can trace its roots back to the British Empire’s Colonial Nursing Association (Rafferty 2005).

c. Immigration Policies

Immigration policies also figure into the flow of health care labor across borders to the extent that selective immigration, especially for skilled workers in areas with shortages, is a strategy increasingly used as an instrument of industrial policy under globalization (Ahmad 2005). Health and long-term care industry organizations in high income countries, who regard international recruitment as a way to address shortages and reduce hiring costs and improve retention, indeed, often lobby to ease immigration requirements in order to gain access to nurses and other care workers (Buchan, Parkin, and Sochalski 2003; Pittman, Folsam, Bass, et al. 2007).

In this context, a for-profit international recruitment industry, involved in a range of activities related to recruitment, testing, credentialing, and immigration has emerged and flourished (Connell and Stillwell 2006; Pittman, Folsam, Bass, et al. 2007). Not only has the size of the industry surged, but so too has the number of countries in which recruiters operate. Many of these countries have high burdens of disease and low nurse-to-population ratios.

d. Health Care Policies

The health care policies and planning failures of governments and other agents operating in the health care arena, especially around cost-containment, also play a role (Pond and McPake 2006). The unprecedented vacancies and turnover rates, and growing trend toward early retirement that characterize nursing and direct care work in the US, for example, are attributable to underinvestment, staffing that is insufficient to support quality patient care, increasing hours, between units, centralized decision-making, inadequate opportunity for continuing education and professional development, poor compensation and benefits, and a pervasive sense of disrespect (Aiken, Clarke, Sloan et al. 2002; Berliner and Ginzberg 2002; Allan and Larsen 2003; Institute of Medicine 2003). The worldwide burgeoning need for long-term care, a sector with especially persistent shortages and poor working conditions, alongside what critics cite as the longstanding absence of coherent long-term care policy, is, for example, a major driver of care worker migration. A recent report argues that the unprecedented reliance on migrant care workers around the world is a symptom of inadequate long-term care policy (International Organization for Migration 2010, 7).

e. The “Choices” of Privileged Families

Middle class and more privileged families also arguably contribute, albeit unwittingly, to the emigration of care workers from less well-off parts of the world. As Joan Tronto (2006) suggests, the tendency to understand caring in private terms, that is, as a matter involving the needs of their loved ones exclusively, has implications for the use of human health resources. Home care provided by emigrant women, for example, is on the rise in many places for those who can afford private help. Seen by the privileged as “[c]heap and flexible, this model is [embraced] to overcome the structural deficiencies of public family care provision [and often, crucially, workplace policies regarding family leave] and strikes a good balance between the conflicting needs of publicly supporting care of the elderly and controlling public expenditure” in privileged parts of the world (Bettio, Simonazzi, and Villa 2006). Trying to do the best they can for their families, often under constraints, families in privileged countries may not consider the implications for those less well off in other parts of the world.

f. Care Regimes

Finally, countries’ “care regimes” can contribute to the flow of migrant workers.  How governments structure provisions for the care of children, the ill and the elderly, including support for family caregivers has implications for the demand of migrant workers.  In countries with strong welfare states and provisions for care of the dependent, there appears to be less demand than in countries with weak welfare states.  What’s more, even in strong welfare states, the structure of the support seems to matter: where support for the dependent and their caregivers is professionalized, or formalized, there is more demand for migrant workers than where schemes are more informal (Michel 2010).

2. Ethical Issues

a. Health Inequities in Source Countries

The hope of many government officials and other policy makers has been that remittances sent back to source countries by those working abroad will stimulate economic growth and development through investment and business opportunities, increase trade and knowledge transfer, and over time, reduce poverty. While remittances channel billions of dollars in money and other goods, there is little agreement on the overall impact of migration on countries that export workers (Page and Plaza 2006; Connell 2010). Most studies do not separate out health care workers specifically. Those that do make distinctions among work type have found variation by particular profession, gender, and family circumstance. Evidence suggests that remittances primarily benefit households, often through poverty reduction. In some cases, migrants remit to invest in community programs and groups, or perhaps businesses. Remittances have also been credited for gains in educational attainment, production increases in sectors like agriculture and manufacturing, and entrepreneurial activity.

Still, there is an overwhelming consensus that when health workers leave, population health erodes. Recent evidence suggests that the adverse effects of losing health workers are not likely compensated by remittances, for they do not contribute to the development of health systems, care provision, or compensate for economic losses of educated workers (Ball 1996; Brown and Connell 2006; OECD 2008; Packer, Runnels and Labonté 2010). Low income countries’ investment in education and training for health care workers who ultimately leave for other shores, say some critics, reflect a “perverse subsidy” (Mackintosh, Mensah, Henry et al. 2006).

Fifty-seven countries face severe health worker shortages (WHO 2006).  These shortages affect both the quantity and the quality of health services available and provided. They worsen inequalities in infant, child and maternal health, vaccine coverage, response capacity for outbreaks and conflict, and mental health care. They lead to striking patient-health care worker ratios (especially in rural and remote areas), hospital, clinic, and program closures, and an increased workload for residing health care workers. Shortages in health personnel are said to be the most critical constraint in achieving the U.N. Millennium Development Goals and the WHO/UNAIDS 3 by 5 Initiative (Chen, Evans, Anand, et al. 2004; Médecins sans Frontières 2007). There is, of course, wide variation among countries when it comes to the impact of health care worker migration, depending upon such factors as size of the country, its geography and demographic make-up, disease burden, stock of trained workers, and so on. People in source countries, however, may get less care than they once did, and it may be given by someone with less education and training than would be the case but for migrations. In addition, people who formerly received care may get none at all. In some source countries, the absence of health care workers has caused a “virtual collapse” of health services (Packer, Labonté, and Runnels, 2009, 214). The gap created is often filled within families, as some governments facing under-resourced health care systems cope by “downloading” the work of caring onto women in individual households (Akintola 2004; Wegelin-Schuringa 2006; Harper, Aboderin, and Ruchieva 2008; Makina 2009). The problem is so grave that the Joint Learning Initiative (2004) concluded that the fate of global health and development in the 21st century lies in ensuring the equitable management of human health resources.

There are many ways of capturing what is at stake ethically for the people in source countries whose health care systems are failing. We might say they are harmed because resources are inequitably distributed (Wibulpolprasert and Pengaibon 2003; Dussault and Franceschini 2006), because the equal moral worth of particular groups of people, and in turn, equal opportunity, is denied (Daniels 2008). We might say, as well, that their welfare interests are threatened. Another view would suggest that global health inequities are morally troubling because deprivations in individuals’ capabilities to function threaten their well-being (Ruger 2006). Following Aristotle’s conception of human flourishing and its contemporary formulation in the “capability approach” of Sen and Nussbaum (Sen 1993), well-being on Ruger’s account is defined as having capabilities to achieve a range of beings and doings, or the freedom to be what we want to be and to do what we want to do.

Although the capabilities approach has not specifically been brought to bear on the problem of health worker migration, other rights-based arguments have played a prominent role. A number of commentators launch critiques of the depletion of source countries’ human health resources based on a human right to health (Gostin 2008; Shah 2010; O’Brien and Gostin 2011), a right ensconced in a number of international declarations including the United Nations Charter, the UN Covenant on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights (1966), and the WHO Constitution (1948). The necessity of the health workforce to the health system, and in turn, to realizing this asserted right, is recognized in the WHO’s Code of Practice on the International Recruitment of Health Personnel (2010b).

The harm, finally, might be explained in terms of structural injustice. Structural injustice

exists when social processes [that is, social norms and economic structures, institutional rules, incentive structures, and sanctions, decision-making processes, etc] put large categories of persons under a systematic threat of domination or deprivation of the means to develop and exercise their capacities, at the same time as these processes enable others to dominate or have a wider range of opportunities for developing and exercising their capacities.

The ethical concern is not merely that structures constrain. “Rather the injustice consists in the way they constrain and enable,” serving systematically to expand opportunities for the privileged while contracting them for the less well-off (Young 2006, 114).

From a plurality of ethical perspectives, then, the asymmetrical migration of care workers is deeply problematic.

b. Autonomy and Equity for Migrant Care Workers

The implications—including ethical, social and political, and economic—for migrant care workers are also significant. Here I explore them with an emphasis on autonomy and equity. If we understand autonomy to mean something like being relatively free to choose one’s actions and course in life from a decent set of options, and equity to mean something like the absence of avoidable and unfair inequalities, the picture that emerges is complex and yields no simple conclusions.

Threats to autonomy and equity for migrant care workers come from several sources. Part of the feminization of international migration, women seeking employment in more affluent countries as maids, nannies, nurses, and other care workers, has come to be an especially integral part of the global economy (Ehrenreich and Hochschild 2002; Van Eyck 2005; Kingma 2006; Dumont, Martin, and Spielvogel 2007). Yet, to the extent that the global migration of nurses and other care workers is fueled by “the ideological construction of jobs and tasks in terms of notions of appropriate femininity” and in terms of racial and cultural stereotypes, it raises concerns. The construction of Filipinas for instance as caring, obedient, meticulous workers, “sacrificing heroines” (Schwenken 2008), of Indian women and Caribbean women as naturally warm-hearted and joyful, serves the aims of governments, industry organizations and employers, recruiters, and even family caregivers in the North. Yet it potentially perpetuates stereotypes and constrains the imaginations, opportunities and choices of women and girls.

Emigrants from low and middle-income countries are situated amidst different genres of nationalist rhetoric that support neoliberal economic policies. One form is organized around specific conceptions of national community, compelling labor migrants to organize their conduct around what is beneficial to states’ economies. Indeed, “the brain drain migrant is a particular subjectivity, forged by the needs of late capitalism.” Her subjectivity becomes “constituted as an assemblage of morality and economic rationality,” within which she “acts in socially appropriate ways not because of force or coercion but [allegedly] because [her] choices align with . . . ‘community interests’” (Ilcan, Oliver, and O’Connor 2007, 80). Another variety of nationalist rhetoric emphasizes “the active citizen,” a “reconfigured political identity . . . whose aim is to maximize . . . quality of life . . . by being [an] active agent in the market” (Schild 2007, 181). These rhetorical strategies operate with a caring face, suggesting that labor emigrants, especially women, will enjoy expanded opportunities for choice and prospects for equality. Yet to the extent that they “encourage[e] and cultivat[e] . . . forms of subjectivity that are congruent with capitalism in its latest phase” (199), enforce expectations for individual responsibility for familial well-being and constrain the set of options available, they may thwart autonomy for many emigrants.

Although married women with children who migrate are encouraged, even pressed—by governments, by family members, or by both given conditions at home—to provide from abroad for their families and countries, and are celebrated as “modern heroes”, they are often blamed for such social ills as divorce, poor school performance by children, and teen pregnancy in their home countries (Parreñas 2005). Gender norms, then, persist and are manipulated, further contributing to the erosion of autonomy and equity.

Most if not all migrant laborers, including those engaged in care work, are subject to “flexibilization,” a “process of self-constitution that correlates with, arises, from, and resembles a mode of social organization” (Fraser 2009, 129). Its central features are fluidity, provisionality, and a temporal horizon of no long-term. Transnational economic and other structures compel care workers to mobilize, for example, when most say they would rather work at home. Movement to care labor markets in the North may involve taking jobs below the education and skill level of care workers, a practice known as “down-skilling”. There is also the rapid expansion of the informal or “grey” economy, and the tendency under neo-liberal economic policies to define more and more jobs as temporary and unskilled. Inequities may persist under such schemes and choices may be constrained.

Furthermore, although countries often incentivize immigration for some workers, including some categories of care workers, questions of immigration and citizenship are contested.  Countries “differentially incorporate” migrants when it comes to immigration and citizenship status (Parreñas 2000; Kofman and Raghuram 2006; Carens 2008). Care workers, especially the “unskilled”, often lack citizenship in the countries where they are employed. They therefore have a limited set of political rights and labor protections (Ball and Piper 2002; Ball 2004; Stasiulis and Bakan 2005; Dauvergne 2009; Bosniak 2009). Access to health and social services may also be diminished or lacking altogether (Meghani and Eckenwiler 2009; Deeb-Sosa and Mendez 2008).

More generally, like other migrants who describe feelings of dislocation, some emigrant nurses describe the experience of “having a foot here, a foot there, and a foot nowhere” (DiCicco-Bloom 2004, 28) and lacking a sense of belonging (Van Eyck 2004; Sørenson 2005; Hausner 2011).  In addition to potential political disenfranchisement and exclusion from labor protections, many live in transnational families and engage in transnational care practices, adjusting to “extended family relations and obligations across space and time” (Baldock 2000, 221; Parreñas 2005). To the extent that selves are relational, that is, our identities shaped by familial relationships and engagement in the communities and places from which we come (Mackenzie and Stolijar 2000), migration leads not just to a geographic rupture but a “self-rupture” in many instances (Kittay unpublished). Indeed, these care workers experience a sort of “bi-placement” of identity, enduring the harm of “never feeling oneself as fully here” (Kittay unpublished; Hondagneu-Sotelo 1997).

Moreover, relations with family members and with their social and political communities may be transformed (Parreñas 2000; Espiritu 2005). They may be improved from the perspective of migrant care workers, or they may be eroded or fractured. Indeed, these moral harms faced by individuals can at the same time threaten the relationships themselves; they may lead others to “reinterpret our social or moral standing . . . [and] compromise the…bonds we have with them” (Miller 2009, 513).

Research finds that migrant care workers can reap significant benefits. There can be important gains for women in areas like self-trust and confidence, household decision-making and expenditures, as well as in spatial mobility and freedom from restrictive gender norms (McKay 2004; Pessar 2005; Percot 2006). They may advance their “migration project”, that is, achieve goals they have (albeit under constrained conditions) set for themselves, whether this means contributing to the well-being of their families and themselves at home, or ultimately gaining traction and stability in destination countries. Depending upon a range of factors, many care workers may well be vulnerable, yet become more autonomous and gain greater opportunity.

In sum, to the extent that migrants decisions to migrate come about because their own countries lack the capacities to support them and their families, and even facilitate their departures, and to the extent that they live and work under conditions that do not just alter but distort their identities, threaten their self-respect, relationships, and political engagement, and that perpetuate their status as lower-paid workers with few options in the global economy, their overall prospects for enhanced autonomy and equity are highly unclear (Abraham 2004; Connell and Voigt-Graf 2006; Espiritu 2006; Barber 2009; Nowak 2009).

c. Social Reproduction and Political Capacity

As global capital uses particular places for particular forms of reproduction, and care workers are cultivated, extracted, and exported for the global marketplace – their labor revalued, repackaged, and relocated – not only do health care systems and the ill and dependent suffer, but family and community life, even political capacities, face erosion. Given that the care done within families generates public goods, like citizens, and contributes to their development and duration over the course of life, when a country exports care labor, that is, the women who provide it, it exports capacities for social reproduction (Truong 1996; Parreñas 2000). Most troublingly, to the extent that those with more resources have greater capacities to care—now by importing it—and those who have more resources are further produced and sustained to become more capable citizens, is that the outflow of caregivers may generate profound additional global inequalities in social and political capacity.

3. Responsibilities

Who is responsible for addressing the harms suffered by emigrant care workers, their families and communities, and populations in source countries confronting high disease burdens and worker shortages? The array of agents involved, and therefore candidates for having responsibilities, includes governments in destination as well as source countries, international lending bodies, transnational health care corporations and recruitment agencies, and those who employ emigrant care workers. I begin by considering views on the matter of whether destination countries have obligations to source countries suffering from health inequities, and from there expand to explore what if any responsibilities might be said to exist for these other agents to source countries as well as emigrants.

a. Responsibilities of Destination Countries

A variety of arguments hold that destination countries are not obligated to address health inequities in source countries. One line of thought, which assumes that there is something ethically essential about the nation-state, is that although we might have some obligations to the world’s poor, we have duties to prioritize our compatriots (Miller 2004). Another line of argument holds that we have duties not to interfere in the affairs of other societies (Rawls 1999). A third view emphasizes distance rather than shared state membership; our moral intuitions, according to this account, suggest that our strongest obligations are to those nearby (Kamm 2004). Finally, libertarian theorists suggest that we have no obligations save for situations where we have caused harm, which on their account comes in the form of unfairly acquiring goods or resources (Nozick 1974).

Others, however, maintain that there are at least negative duties and possibly positive ones to address health inequities and other problems generated or worsened by the asymmetrical migration of health care workers. Some argue that our shared human dignity is sufficient to ground responsibilities for global health equity. We have duties, in other words, to prevent suffering when we have the capacity to do so on the basis of our equal moral worth as persons (Singer 1972). Countering the argument that we ought not to interfere in the affairs of other societies, a republican approach holds that freedom should be conceived in terms of non-domination rather than non-interference, and this may generate responsibilities of justice that cross borders (Petit 1997). Luck egalitarian accounts maintain that people should not suffer worse opportunities based on where they come from, so justice demands assistance (Caney 2005).

Arguing from various relational conceptions of justice, some theorists point to the dense relations of interdependence that connect people transnationally to justify principles of justice that transcend the boundaries of states. There are several ways to think about these relations, which are more particular than our shared humanity. According to Onora O’Neill (2000), an agent’s moral obligation encompasses all those people whom his or her activities depend upon, and so, is often global in scope. Thomas Pogge maintains that by “shaping and enforcing the social conditions that foreseeably and avoidably cause the monumental suffering of global poverty, we are harming the global poor …” (2005, 33). According to this view, our relationship is a matter of being “materially involved” in or “substantially contributing to” upholding the institutions responsible for injustice (2004, 137). Iris Marion Young proposes a third relational approach: a “social connection model of responsibility”. Here “[o]bligations of justice arise between [agents] by virtue of the social [often transnational] processes that connect them” (Young 2006, 102). Relational conceptions of justice, thus, implicate not only destination countries, but also the other agents who contribute through their policies and practices to the global, asymmetrical flow of care workers and the inequities this exacerbates. They also highlight the limits of libertarian and non-interventionist accounts.

The complexity of the processes and relations involved in generating injustice presents challenges when it comes to the work of attributing and assigning responsibilities. Given the way that structures and processes operate, responsibility is diffused, or dispersed. It can therefore be difficult if not impossible to identify a particular perpetrator (individual, institutional, or corporate) to whom particular harms might be traced directly. As Young explains, while “structural processes that produce injustice result from the actions of many persons and the policies of many organizations, in most cases it is not possible to trace which specific actions of which specific agents cause which specific parts of the structural processes or their outcomes” (Young 2006, 115). At the same time, adverse effects are not necessarily intended.  Indeed, structural injustice often occurs as a result of our (individual and institutional) choices and actions as we try to advance our own interests “within given institutional rules and accepted norms” (114).

There is one further line of argument that might be brought to bear here. Responsibility can be motivated by prudential arguments, specifically those that acknowledge global interdependence. In other words, motivated by the idea that negative and positive externalities flow over national boundaries that are increasingly porous, the prudential approach justifies state-based action with transnational implications by affirming our interdependence along with the existence of ‘global public goods’. The idea is “to let international cooperation start ‘at home’, with national policies meant, at a minimum, to reduce or avoid altogether negative cross-border spillovers – and preferably to go beyond that to generate positive externalities in the interest of all” (Kaul, Grunberg and Stern 1999). Even, then, if agents are not motivated by moral reasons, prudence may generate responsible action and policy on the part of destination countries for the sake of source countries (Eckenwiler, Chung, and Straehle 2012).

b. Responsibilities of Other Agents

States are certainly not the sole actors on this moral landscape. Typically in discussions of global justice, including discussions of global health equity, states are assumed to have primary responsibility; that is, the “most direct and prior obligations” (Ruger 2006, 1001). Yet, states’ limitations are many. Some states do not have the capability to ensure justice. Others may lack the desire. And some states with the desire to be just are rendered more porous by the activities of other agents—what Onora O’Neill calls “networking institutions” (here, for instance: international lenders, health care corporations and recruiters) operating and exercising power within their borders (O’Neill 2000, 182-185; 2004 246–47). Conceptions of justice, therefore, must reckon with such agents if they are to have any traction under globalization. As noted earlier, relational approaches do, and in turn, assign responsibilities according to such parameters as their scope of power, resources, and degree of contribution to injustice (O’Neill 2000; Young 2006).

As for emigrant and other migrant care workers, the responsibilities of destination countries and those of networking institutions might include reforms in areas such as: recruitment policies and practices; immigration policy; and compensation and working conditions. I discuss these further in the final section.

4. Remedies

An array of interventions and ideas has emerged to try to address at least some of the concerns raised here (Stillwell, Diallo, Zurn et al. 2004; Mensah, Mackintosh and Henry 2005; Packer, Labonté, and Spitzer 2007). They aim variously at responding to health inequities, global health workforce management, and workers’ status and treatment. In the discussion below I focus on efforts underway along with ideas for further reform.

a. Political and Institutional Strategies

Perhaps the most important mechanisms embraced by governments to date are legally binding bilateral or multilateral agreements between source countries or regions and destination countries. These involve agreements for supplies of health professionals from particular countries (specifically those not suffering under low care worker-population ratios and/or high disease burdens) for specified lengths of time to address particular skill shortages. The UK and South Africa, for example, have a bilateral agreement, and some countries within the European Union have multilateral agreements. Recent evidence suggests that state policies can indeed have an impact on health worker migration (Bach 2010). In a related vein, some have called for global resource sharing, including staff sharing programs (Mackey and Liang 2012).

Codes of practice and position statements aimed at protecting the health systems of source countries and ensuring ethical treatment for migrant health workers have also emerged. They emphasize not recruiting from countries with severe shortages and high disease burdens, refraining from unethical recruitment practices, such as deception and misrepresentation, and treating migrant care workers with respect and providing them with labor protections. There are roughly twenty documents developed by governments, including the United Kingdom (UK Department of Health 2004), associations of governments like the Commonwealth Countries (2003) and Pacific Island Countries (Ministers of Health for Pacific Island Countries 2007), along with health professional associations, such as the World Health Organization (2010), the World Federation of Public Health Associations (2005), Academy Health (2008) and the American Public Health Association (Hagopian and Friedman 2006).

While such instruments draw attention to important issues and can raise the level of discourse, a major limit is that they do not address the root causes of migration.  They are also voluntary and their impact is difficult to monitor (Buchan, McPake, Mensah, and Rae 2009). Moreover, the structure and financing of a country’s health system is a significant factor when it comes to their scope. In the UK, for example, which has one major public sector employer and one point of entry for health professionals, a code may have more of an impact than in countries with a wide array of independent private sector health care employers (Buchan, Parkin, and Sochalski 2003; Buchan, McPake, Mensah, and Rae 2009).

b. Compensation for Source Countries

Motivated by compensatory justice, various compensation schemes have been suggested (Agwu and Llewelyn 2009). One model calls for governments of host or destination countries to pay source countries for the investments made in educating health professionals. Alternatively, destination countries could offer funding or other forms of investment for the purpose of capacity building and strengthening health systems in source countries (Mackintosh, Mensah, Henry et al. 2006).

c. Retention Efforts in Source Countries

Perhaps one of the most difficult questions concerns whether health workers have obligations to serve the countries that have provided their education and training (leaving aside countries where export is embedded in economic policy) (Cole 2010; Raustol 2010). Closely tied to this question is the extent to which, if at all, coercion (and what this means precisely) is justified in countries’ policies around health worker migration, particularly retention policies (Eyal and Hurst 2010). Proposals that raise such concerns range from financial and other incentives, where possible, to compulsory service requirements of some specified duration and taxes on migrants (Packer, Labonté, and Spitzer 2007; Masango, Gathu, and Sibandze 2008; Barnighausen and Bloom 2009). Another idea aimed at retaining health care workers is to organize medical school and other health worker curricula in low and middle-income countries around “locally relevant” needs and capacities (Eyal and Hurst 2008). Meanwhile, many source countries are trying to increase training efforts among community and other auxiliary health care workers to fill gaps (Global Health Workforce Alliance 2008).

d. Economic Policy Reform

Global economic policy that shifts to address the constraints that lead to migration faced by care workers in source countries is often the first item on health advocates’ list of reforms. This would mean an end to structural adjustment policies and an investment in health system infrastructure that will staff sufficient numbers and varieties of health care workers, fairly compensate and treat them, and serve the public equitably.

e. Health Policy Planning for the Long-term and Shared Governance for Health

At the country level, specifically in destination countries, long-range planning is clearly essential. When it comes to public health, notes one commentator, “the future is no where in sight” (Graham 2010). Indeed,

[In] spite of its importance, workforce planning and management have traditionally been viewed as low priority by many countries… supply driven with limited attention afforded to population health needs, service demand factors and social, political, geographical, technological and economic factors….[and] carried out in…silos rather than integrated across the various health disciplines/occupations (International Council of Nurses 2006, 10).

Policy makers in such places indisputably have obligations to address these issues for the sake of their own populations. And as has been shown here, many conceptions of justice maintain they also owe it to the poorer nations upon whom they’ve come to rely.

Some might argue for self-sufficiency in human heath resource planning (Mullan, Frehywot and Jolley 2008). This goal seems morally praiseworthy in its quest to avoid unjust relationships between richer and poorer countries. Skepticism as to whether it can be realized given conditions under globalization suggests to many that “shared health governance” ought to become the new model (Ruger 2006, 1001). The precise meaning of this notion is a matter of vitriolic debate; however, in the most general terms it involves governments and global institutions, along with non-governmental organizations, businesses, and foundations, engaged collaboratively in decision-making processes aimed at meeting the specific needs and addressing the constraints particular countries face. Advocates for shared governance over human health resources point to the fact that some form of this is reflected already in a number of areas, including access to essential medicines, vaccines, and tobacco control (O’Brien and Gostin 2011).

f. Practices of “Privileged Responsibility”

The discussion so far has emphasized states and “networking institutions”, and political-legal-institutional reforms. Some contemporary moral and political philosophers, however, would maintain that there is a tendency to underestimate the potential of personal interactions and practices among individuals (Walker 1998; Kurasawa 2007). According to Fuyuki Kurasawa, for example, a “formalist bias” that involves understanding global justice as emerging principally through prescriptive or legislative means, overlooks “the social labour and modes of practice that supply the ethical and political soil within which the norms, institutions and procedures of global justice are rooted” (Kurasawa 2007, 6). He identifies five practices: bearing witness, forgiveness, giving aid, solidarity, and foresight. Such practices may accompany or in some cases facilitate political, legal, economic, and institutional reform.

Here I consider practices that concern the ethical stance people in source countries – especially but not exclusively those who employ them – owe to these emigrants. There are international agreements that call for elements of what I note below, such as the International Convention on the Protection of the Rights of All Migrant Workers and Members of Their Families. I describe three practices, drawing upon Tronto’s concept (2006), of “privileged responsibility”: preventive foresight and solidarity (following Kurasawa), and recognition.

i. Preventive Foresight

Tronto’s argument is that the tendency among middle class and more affluent families to understand caring (particularly for children, the ill, and the dependent) in private terms, that is, as a matter involving the needs of their loved ones exclusively, can lead to moral hazards including social harm. “In a competitive society,” she observes, “what it means to care well for one’s own [family] is to make sure that they have a competitive edge against other [families]” (2006, 10). Ultimately, those acting with what Tronto describes as “privileged irresponsibility” can “ignore the ways in which their own caring activities continue to perpetuate inequality” (13).

To respond to this and other myopias, individuals and families with resources in wealthy countries might practice “preventive forsesight” (Kurasawa 2007) and plan ahead for their own care needs and think critically about their anticipated use of resources. They might ask themselves for example: To what extent do my/our “expectations” or actual needs have implications for others in need of care? Other families? Other communities? Could I/we plan and act in such a way that might avoid or lessen participation in the perpetuation of injustice?

ii. Recognition

Another way of taking seriously the moral status and significance of migrant care workers, their work, and the implications of their mobility might be through the practice of recognition. Recognition has come to be understood in at least two senses: recognition of individuals’ unique identity as an autonomous individual and recognition of persons as belonging to particular communities or groups. It also includes a third dimension, the recognition of others’ needs for relationships, both interpersonal and associative (Gould 2007, 250). Recognizing emigrant care workers in this way might enrich appreciation for the fact that many live in transnational families. Additionally, recognizing interdependence could mitigate against ignorance concerning health inequities in source countries. A fourth dimension might be added: recognition of the conditions – the places – in which care workers provide care, including conditions in the places where their numbers are few, the disease burden is high, and available resources scant.

iii. Solidarity

Solidarity, an increasingly examined concept both in health ethics as well as global justice, may have relevance here. Contemporary thinking on solidarity suggests that it involves reaching beyond the scope of one’s community to cultivate ties with others who have suffered injustice across distance and amid asymmetries, and standing together in advancing justice and resisting injustice (Gould 2007; Lenard 2010). Relations of solidarity might be forged, for example, between governments, employers and employees, people with diminished access to health care, migrant workers, and family caregivers and care workers for moral or prudential reasons (Eckenwiler, Chung, and Straehle 2012).

5. Conclusion

Health worker migration is not the main cause of health inequities; yet, it contributes to them and possibly others. Thus, conditions that facilitate, and the moral agents who participate in facilitating, migration (above all, asymmetrical) call for moral scrutiny. Additionally, the treatment of emigrant care workers warrants ethical investigation. Policies and practices that undermine values such as autonomy and equity should be seen as morally suspect. Finally, the state-level and global management of human health resources demands urgent attention. The present structure characterized by a “perverse subsidy”, ongoing underinvestment in health care (often where it is most needed), even in destination countries, and narrowly nationalist thinking threatens justice for populations everywhere, especially the poor.

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Author Information

Lisa Eckenwiler
George Mason University
U. S. A.

Ralph Cudworth (1617—1688)

CudworthRalph Cudworth was an English philosopher and theologian, representative of a seventeenth century movement known as the Cambridge Platonists.  These were the first English philosophers to publish primarily in their native tongue, and to use Plato as a core influence.  Three of Cudworth’s works: The True Intellectual System of the Universe, A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality, and A Treatise on Freewill together constitute the most complete available exposition of the Platonist world-view.

The Platonist School formed as a response to the intellectual crisis following the Calvinist victory in the English Civil Wars.  The Calvinists believed that human intellect was useless for understanding God’s will.  Only revelation was acceptable. With the death of Charles I, and the failure of traditional authority, several factions of Calvinism sought to define the new order that would replace the old order according to their own revelations. Without any mediating authority, or grounds to negotiate compromise, violence was often the result.

The Platonists constructed a natural theology supporting the concept of free will, and opposing the materialism of Thomas Hobbes. To its members, there was no natural divide between philosophy and theology.  Reason could, therefore, sort out rival theological and ethical claims without the violence that had troubled their generation.

To support this agenda, Cudworth devoted himself to developing a model of the universe, based on a vast body of both ancient and contemporary sources.  His ontology was based upon Neoplatonism, and involved a World-Soul he called “Plastic Nature.”  His epistemology was an amended Platonism, where the “Essences” that served as the standards of rationality, ordering both the mind and the universe, were innate to God.  In order to support the concept that people have free will, he developed a modern-sounding psychology derived from Epictetus’s Stoic psychology.  With this theory he attacked the concepts of materialism, voluntarism, and determinism.

The Cambridge School was primarily a reactionary assembly, and they largely dissolved when the Restoration of the Monarchy provided a political resolution to their generation’s concerns.  However, Cudworth exerted a subtle influence on later generations.  Through his daughter Damaris, his ideas helped to shape the philosophies of John Locke and Gottfried Leibniz, among others.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Publications
    1. Sermons
    2. The True Intellectual System of the Universe
    3. Posthumous works
  3. The Cambridge Platonists
    1. Calvinist Doctrines
    2. Platonist Responses
    3. Sources and Influences
  4. Themes in Cudworth’s Work
    1. The Essences and Rational Theology
    2. Ontology
      1. The Necessity of Dualism
      2. Atomic Materialism
      3. “Stratonical” Materialism
      4. Plastic Nature
    3. Epistemology
      1. Knowledge as Propositional
      2. The Essences in Epistemology
      3. Plastic Nature in Epistemology
      4. The Failings of Plastic Nature in Epistemology
    4. Free Will
      1. The Hegemonikon
      2. God’s Choice
      3. Human Choice
  5. Cudworth’s Influence
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography


Ralph Cudworth was born in Aller, Somerset, in 1617.  His father was Ralph Cudworth, the Rector of Aller, a Fellow of Emmanuel College, Cambridge, and a former chaplain to King James I.  His mother, Mary Machell Cudworth, had been a nurse for James’s elder son, Henry.  Cudworth Senior died in 1624, and Mary Cudworth then married Doctor John Stoughton who replaced him as Rector of Aller.  Stoughton also saw to young Ralph’s home schooling.

In 1632, Cudworth enrolled in Emmanuel.  He received a Bachelor of Arts in 1635 and a Masters of Arts in 1639.  He was also elected a Fellow of Emmanuel, at this time, and began to serve as a tutor.  Cudworth earned a Bachelors of Divinity in 1646 and a Doctorate in Divinity in 1651.  During this time, he also became a friend of Benjamin Whichcote, the founder of the philosophical and theological movement known as The Cambridge Platonists.

During the English Civil Wars, Cudworth’s sympathies were with Parliament.  In 1644, representatives of Parliament appointed Cudworth to serve as the Master of Clair Hall, replacing a monarchist who had been ejected from that post.  In the next year, he was named Regius Professor in Hebrew.  From 1650 to 1654, he also served as the rector of North Cadbury, Somerset, which operated under the authority of Emmanuel College.  In 1654, Cudworth left both Clair Hall and the rectory to become the master of Christ’s College, Cambridge.

Judged a political moderate, Cudworth retained his position at Christ’s College upon the restoration of the monarchy, in 1660.  Sheldon, the Bishop of London, named him the Vicar of Ashwell, Hetford in 1662.  He was also given the Prebendry of Gloucester in 1678.   He died on June 26, 1688, at Cambridge, and was buried in the chapel at Christ’s College.

After becoming master of Christ’s College, Cudworth married Damaris Craddock Andrews.  They had two sons, John, and Charles, and one daughter, Damaris.  John and Charles Cudworth both died before their father.  Damaris Cudworth survived, and would anonymously author two philosophic works of her own: A Discourse Concerning the Love of God, and Occasional Thoughts. She also wrote the first biography of John Locke, with whom she was a close friend and correspondent.  She also wrote to Gottfried Leibniz, with whom she debated the merits of both her father’s works, and of Locke’s.

2. Publications

a. Sermons

Cudworth’s publications include theological texts such as A Discourse Concerning the True Notion of the Lords Supper (1642), and The Union of Christ and the Church, (1642).  He also published various sermons, including A Sermon before the House of Commons (1647).  As with most Platonists a good deal of his philosophical theories are expressed through published transcriptions of their sermons. This made them the first philosophers to express their theories primarily in English.  Cudworth would also write more conventional philosophical arguments to support their program.

b. The True Intellectual System of the Universe

His philosophical work is dominated by The True Intellectual System of the Universe: the First Part wherein All the Reason and Philosophy of Atheism is Confuted and Its Impossibility Demonstrated (1678). The System was supposed to be an exhaustive, three-part presentation of his entire Platonist world-view.  In his first volume he would attack atheism, most particularly as interpreted by Hobbes.  Thus, this work would also be arguing against Materialism.  The second volume would attack Voluntarism, as was accepted by John Calvin.  In the third, he would directly argue against the fatalism accepted by both Calvin and Hobbes.

However, the first volume of the System became controversial upon publication.  Some saw a crypto-atheism in Cudworth’s didactic style.  He first stipulated what he saw as all of the arguments for materialism and atheism, and then, after outlining his general philosophic positions, showed how that system answered all of these arguments.  Many found his initial arguments more compelling than his later responses.  This led some to wonder if this was not the intent.  Others disputed interpretations of Christian doctrine expressed in the System.  In response to these problems, Cudworth chose to suspend the project.

c. Posthumous works

Cudworth’s posthumous publications include A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality (1731), and A Treatise on Freewill (1838). These are based upon surviving manuscripts of the projected continuation of the True System. In 1733, his True Intellectual System was translated to Latin and published in France by J. L. von Mosheim as Systema intellectuale hujus Universi, seu de veris Naturae originibus, correcting several Greek translations in the original, and introducing the work to a Continental audience.

3. The Cambridge Platonists

Cudworth was nominally a Calvinist, but he was not orthodox.  As a member of the Platonist movement, he rejected significant elements of the Calvinist theology.

a. Calvinist Doctrines

Orthodox Calvinists are voluntarists.  To them, God is primarily omnipotent, and nothing, not even logic, can restrain Him.  If He chose to make a man a married bachelor, for example, that would be easily within His power.  This meant that all of His activities are merely to be the absurd assertions of the universe’s unique existentialist subject.

As a consequence, Calvinists are also Enthusiasts, to whom all theological knowledge came to man through divine revelation.  Man’s rational powers, bound to logic, are simply useless with reference to God.  Believing that theology is the only acceptable grounding for ethics, this implies, to Calvinists that ethical standards are similarly dependent on divine fiat and revelation.

In addition, Calvinists were Fatalists, rejecting the concept of human free will.  If free will existed, they would argue, an individual would have more power over their own actions than had God.  This would compromise God’s absolute power.  Human actions would also be contingent, and thus, unpredictable.  This would compromise His omniscience.  Neither compromise was acceptable to the Calvinists, so they restricted all agency to the omnipotence of the Supreme Being.

Finally, Calvinism taught that, as a result of Original Sin, man’s nature was totally depraved, and irremediable through human efforts.  Unable to control his fate, man was wholly dependent on God for his moral status.  Neither his reason, nor his will could improve his character.

b. Platonist Responses

The Cambridge Platonists unanimously rejected all of these positions. Cudworth called them “the theory of the arbitrary deity.”(Ralph Cudworth, The True Intellectual System of the Universe, II.529.)  Their goal was to vindicate the power of the human intellect, and human moral responsibility.  To do otherwise, in their eyes, rendered any conception of God’s wisdom and goodness meaningless.

Instead, they supported a natural theology which could prove the existence of God, and the superiority of Christianity.  Beyond these basic points, disputes between individuals with different beliefs could and should be settled with debate, when this was possible.  When this method failed to produce a definitive resolution, they argued, differences between belief systems should be tolerated in the spirit of humility.  If humanity really needed to understand something, God, as a rational and benevolent entity, would allow it the information required to develop an understanding.  Thus, all people who make an honest effort to understand God, should and, in fact, did, come up with the same basic theological positions.  Education and rational persuasion are the only methods required to correct differences that exist between good people on fundamental matters.  Because man’s theological and ethical deliberations were capable of yielding some results, he must be, at least to the limited extent that his finite reasoning faculty allows, capable of taking some remedial steps towards his own salvation.

This position is formally known as “Latitudinarianism.” It would dominate Cudworth’s writings and sermons, beginning with A Sermon before the House of Commons.  The largest segment of the True System amounts to an attempted historical demonstration of Latitudinarianism.  There, he seeks to prove that all great thinkers in history were believers in God who agreed on the basic points of Christian doctrine.  He conducts an encyclopedic review of the history of philosophy, as he knew it, to garner support for this point.

Unfortunately, these historical digressions are more efforts at myth-making than legitimate arguments.  In order to demonstrate the reasonableness of Christianity, the author rewrites philosophic history to show that as many ancient philosophers as possible were, in some sense, Christian.  He also expands the borders of Christian doctrine so as to accommodate as many diverse philosophies as possible within it.  Both philosophy and Christian doctrine suffer some violence in this process.  As a result, after the System’s publication, several readers accused Cudworth of some form heresy, generally Tritheism, or Arianism.

c. Sources and Influences

The Cambridge Platonists’ primary intellectual resource was, obviously, Plato.  The Cambridge Platonists would be the first English philosophers to use him so prominently in their works.  However, their understanding of Plato was mediated by St. Augustine’s Neoplatonism.  Thus, they tended to confuse Plato’s beliefs with that of Plotinus.  Aristotle and the Stoics were also among their major influences.

Platonists also felt the influence of their contemporaries.  They particularly appreciated the rationalism of both Hobbes and René Descartes.  But, Descartes was a voluntarist.  At the same time, his theory of innate ideas seemed, to the Platonists, to lead to psychological determinism analogous to his mechanistic conception of material actions.  This paradoxically left it with what Cudworth called a “tang of the atheistic mechanistic humour.”(True System, I.283)  On the other hand, Hobbes’s rationalism led him to determinism, materialism, moral relativism, and, it seemed, atheism.  The Platonists could not accept either option.

Cudworth, in particular, was very historically-minded.  He tried to incorporate as many historic philosophers as possible into his arguments.  He seems to have believed that all of his contemporaries’ philosophical positions were passed down from some ancient thinker.  This skewed his understanding of contemporary thinkers, such as Thomas Hobbes, who seemed, to Cudworth, nothing more than a contemporary follower of Democritus.

4. Themes in Cudworth’s Work

a. The Essences and Rational Theology

To Cudworth, in a universe where God’s omnipotence trumped His omniscience, there would be no final truths for Him to know. “Truth and falsehood would be only names.  Neither would there be any more certainty in the knowledge of God, himself.” (True System, III. 539)  So, he concluded, if God is omniscient, as Christian doctrine dictates, then there must be eternal truths to know, which are invulnerable to His power.

To be eternal, at least in the sense intended in Platonic Theism that Cudworth espouses, these truths would have to be self-justifying, logically necessary principles, and not mere conditional facts.  Cudworth called them the “Essences.”  They are his equivalent of Plato’s Forms.  To Cudworth, such eternal principles “do not exist without us…but in the mind, itself.”(True System, III. 622)  Human minds cannot directly bear such entities, because they, themselves, are not eternal: “of that which is in constant change nothing may be affirmed as constantly true.”(True System, III. 627; quoting Aristotle, Metaphysics, 4.5)  The principles must exist within a mind that is also eternal.  The only such mind is God’s.  And so, Cudworth concludes, logically necessary principles exist as natural configurations of God’s mind.  They do not exist above Him, but as a self-disciplining element of His divine psychology.

With God’s mind disciplined by the logic of the Essences, He and His works must always be rational.  This means that, to the extent allowed by finite human capacities, rational deliberation can, with confidence, develop sound opinions concerning God, and His works.  Revelation, although possible, in such a theory, is not necessary for theological or ethical judgments.  Moreover, revealed theological truths must be reasonable, so disputes between revelations may be solved through sufficient rational analysis.  If man cannot resolve such a dispute, it must be because his rational powers are insufficient to the task, and so, his proper attitude towards the issue should be one of humility, not violent intolerance.

Cudworth also uses these Essences as a Design Argument for the existence of God.  If the human mind can understand the universe, at least to some extent, through reason, he contends, then necessary logical principles must guide the universe.  But necessary logical principles must be eternal truths.  Eternal truths that can only exist contained within an eternal mind.  This mind, by virtue of such containment, would know, and direct, the universe.  Thus, because man can use reason to gain knowledge of the universe, there is a rational God.

b. Ontology

i. The Necessity of Dualism

Cudworth’s Ontology is the primary focus of The True System. He begins it by gathering all of the various forms of atheism and reduces them to two general types, each founded on a different form of materialism.  The first is atomism.  It holds that matter consists of individual particles, each of which is incapable of initiating motion its own.  Cudworth calls the other “Stratonical” materialism, after Strato Lampsacus, the third director of the Lyceum.  It allows matter to initiate action, claiming that the universe is a single, self-organizing, but non-conscious entity.  In keeping with his Latitudinarian beliefs, Cudworth is willing to adopt each of these theories, up to a point.

But, Cudworth defines matter as being necessarily non-conscious.  As the universe is active, and the logical order of the universe implies, to Cudworth, the existence of an eternal logical mind, it seems obvious that matter cannot account for the entire universe.  Cudworth address, and rejects, the possibility that consciousness comes into existence as an emergent property.  Citing the Neoplatonic doctrine that “an effect cannot be superior to its cause”(True System, III.81) and the logical principle that “nothing comes from nothing,”(True System, II.67) he argues that it is clearly absurd and paradoxical that such things come from a substance that does not itself demonstrate any potential for either property.  Therefore, either line of thought goes astray when it leads to materialism and atheism.

ii. Atomic Materialism

Cudworth supports the conception that matter is made of atomic particles, but holds that this belief and atheism are fundamentally incompatible.  To him, matter is an essentially passive entity.  Therefore, the atomic motion which accounts for all mechanical action is as a reaction to an outside stimulus.  But this stimulus cannot be material, or else we are left with a vicious cycle.  Following Thomas Aquinas’s Cosmological Argument, this cycle can only be broken by having in an unmoved mover operating somewhere in the causal history of an event.  Only God has such a resume.  And so, Cudworth concludes, atomists must not be materialists.  They must be dualists who believe in an eternal God, if they are to be logically consistent.

Having established this, to his satisfaction, Cudworth turns to myth-making.  He advances a history of atomic theory that he shared with his friend, fellow Cambridge Platonist, Henry More.  Democritus, he claims, was not the first atomist, but merely the first atheistic atomist.  Atomism was, in fact, taught by Moses, and was brought to Greece by Pythagoras.  From him, it was supposedly passed down to Plato, Aristotle, Plutarch and others.  Leucippus and Democritus evidently took this original philosophy and corrupted it into atheism.

iii. “Stratonical” Materialism

“Stratonical” materialism is a variation of Plato’s Organicism. It agrees with Plato that the universe is a single, self-organizing, entity, but stipulates that this principle is wholly unconscious and material.  Instead it grants matter the ability to initiate action.

Cudworth rejects this adaptation of Plato.  To him, it is impossible for an entity to operate in a logical, orderly manner, without both the regulation of the Essences to establish what logic and order are, and some sort of consciousness to access these principles.  There are clearly apparent, and logically predictable, patterns in the objects, and actions of the universe.  Therefore, logic and the Essences exist.

But, the Essences are phenomena of the mind of God, existing nowhere else.  So, there must be more than even activist matter in the universe.  There must be a God, and matter must have some connection to God, in order to operate in accord with the Essences, which are mental phenomena.  There must be some sort of connector between matter and spirit.  This connector would, indeed, bind the universe, in one sense, into a single entity, but not on the purely material level of atoms.

iv. Plastic Nature

Cudworth believes that this connection is provided by a form of World Soul.  He finds ancient authority to support this conception, and much more successfully than he did in reference to atomism.  This disciplining force is clearly related to the World Soul described in the Plato’s Timaeus, and in the Stoic tradition. It is also an interpretation of Plotinus’s Third Hypostasis.  Such a world-soul does indeed bind the universe into one entity, but not through mere matter.

However, the greatest influence behind Cudworth’s conception of this force was Henry More.  Originally a follower of Descartes, More eventually opposed Cartesian ontology, because due to the general Platonist distaste for mechanism.  To replace this theory, he developed his conception of “the Natural Spirit,” or “the Hylarchic Principle.”  This principle traced the causal history of events through the interaction of matter with spirit, instead of through interactions between two or more material objects, while maintaining deterministic causality for material events.  Cudworth took this idea, and called it “Plastic Nature.”

More suggested that matter and spirit both exist in space.  When an atom of matter coexists with spirit, within the same space, they become, “bound by the law of fate.”(True System, III.674)  The result is Plastic Nature.  When the active spiritual element of plastic moves in accord with the logic of the Essences, it carries the passive material atom on which it has overlaid with it, resulting in a physical event.

This overlay renders the spiritual element of Plastic Nature unconscious.  Its motion is not deliberative, but analogous to the body’s autonomic system.  Nevertheless, all spiritual actions are defined by logical principles.  So, the activities of plastic nature are rational, determined, and predictable through the exercise of reason.  This allows animals, plants, and un-living nature to behave in an orderly manner, though all three lack native intelligence.

Still, the full scope of the Essences cannot be apprehended or enacted by an unconscious hybrid like Plastic Nature.  Some of them, such as the rational principles which imply moral standards, are too subtle.  So, Plastic Nature sometimes operates amorally, or even self-destructively, as when moths seek the sun, and fly into a flame; or rain falls on the just and the unjust alike.  God might be aware of the fall of every sparrow, but he need not directly conspire in the event.  Neither need He be found responsible for the death of moths, or the democracy of the weather.  Such events are attributed to the autonomic system of the universe, operating according to a crude apprehension of the true logical order found in God’s mind.  Contemplation of this true order requires the use of a fully conscious mind, without material contamination.

c. Epistemology

i. Knowledge as Propositional

Cudworth’s epistemology is based on the understanding that all knowledge is propositional. Beliefs that cannot be expressed in a proposition, such as “All men are mortal,” are not “known.”  Thus, the elements of a logical proposition—quantifiers, subjects, predicates and copulas--must be somehow present in the mind as a precondition of knowledge.  However, none of these things are determinable by the senses.  Both subjects and predicates are universals, such as “men” and “mortal.” Quantifiers, like “all,” and copulas such as “are,” are logical relations.  Senses only have contact with individual objects and properties as they exist relative to the observer.  Therefore, propositional knowledge is not empirical in nature.  It is a judgment arising from an active intellect already possessed with some logical capacities.

As God has knowledge, these universals must also be known to Him.  They must also be the models of his creations and the rational determinants of His acts.  They must be, in short, the Essences.

ii. The Essences in Epistemology

Humans do not have the direct access to these ideas that God enjoys. Cudworth is uncomfortable with the idea that humans might have innate ideas of the Essences.  Such theories as Descartes’ imply, to him, a form of epistemic determinism with the human mind pre-programmed to know certain truths, which have inevitable logical implications.  To Cudworth, who believes that both theology and ethics were developed through human reason, instead of revelation, epistemological determinism would imply an ethical determinism, where man is bound to come to a particular conclusion in either field.  This would make human moral and epistemic error hard to explain.

Because God is perfect, a kind of determinism as to the accuracy of His knowledge and moral decisions is essential to His nature, at least in cases where one belief or option is actually better than the others.  His ideas are innate.  But, to fill what Cudworth saw as our proper role in the order of things, humans must possess a useful, but less accurate, method of developing a consciousness of the same Essences.

iii. Plastic Nature in Epistemology

The senses do have a significant epistemological role in this method.  They stimulate the rational faculties of the mind.  The physical senses, guided by Plastic Nature, react to a sense-stimulation and draw information into the mind.  But all that the senses alone can detect would be “a thing which affects our sense in respect of figure or color.”(True System, III.584)  The determination that these properties are conjoined to an object, and that the same properties are universals, capable of manifesting simultaneously in multiple objects and locations, are rational judgments.  “(The mind)… exerts ‘conceptions’...upon our perceptions” (Ibid.) so that we might know objects.

Moreover, these conceptions must represent objective, universal principles.  If they did not exist as objective and universal entities, then knowledge would be of a purely relativistic and subjective nature.  They would be “phantasms” which we would not be able to communicate with one another, because we would each exist in a different epistemological universe.  They would also be irredeemably vague, because they are without any disciplining principle, except our own will, which is in flux.  And, finally, we would be unable to infer anything from them, because they are all particular.

To Cudworth and the Platonists, this ordering role is filled by Plastic Nature.  In addition to operating material events in accord with logic, Plastic Nature is also responsible for the autonomic elements of human behavior.  Cudworth ascribes dreams, and all other operations of what we call the unconscious mind to Plastic Nature manifest in the human mind.  Included in these, Cudworth holds, are the most basic projection of order onto our perceptions, so that we can be capable of logical deliberation.

According to Cudworth, when our eyes are stimulated by seeing a white object, or a black object, Plastic Nature instinctively abstracts the notions of Whiteness or Blackness from these experiences, and submits these concepts to the conscious mind.  The same is true for all basic universals.  Now the mind has something to reason about, and may detect logical relations among them these basic Essences.  Cudworth lists these relations as “Cause, Effect, Means, End, Order, Proportion, Similitude, Dissimilitude, Equality, Inequality, Aptitude, Inaptitude, Symmetry, Asymmetry, Whole, Part, Genus, Species, and the like.”(True System, III.586)  Propositions, and thus, knowledge, become possible.

Knowing objects, we also come to see corporate entities made up of several particular individuals “which, though sometimes locally discontinued, yet are joined together by...relations...,” and, “all conspiring into one thing imperceptible by sense...yet...not mere figments.” Conceptions, of such things as a nation, are an example of such a “totem.”  “(The development of such ideas)…proceeds merely from the intuitive power and the activity of the mind” which provides just those relations which allow that abstraction to be possible.”(Ibid. 593)


…a house, or a palace is not only stone, brick, mortar, timber, iron, glass, heaped is made up of relative... notions it being a certain disposition of those materials into a ‘totem’ consisting of several parts, rooms, stairs, passages, doors, chimneys, windows, convenient for habitation, and fit for several functions among men....this logical form which is the passive stamp or print of intellectuality upon it. (Ibid. 594)

At this point, the spiritual, conscious element of the mind can also infer the existence of Essences which are not directly represented in experience.  The ideas that the mind has already developed logically imply these new ideas.  Examples of such ideas are: “Wisdom, Folly, Prudence, Imprudence, Knowledge, Ignorance, Verity, Falsity, Virtue, Vice, Honesty, Dishonesty, Justice, Injustice, Volition, Cognition, and Sense, Itself.”(Ibid. 586)  Ethics and Mathematics are also products of this process.  From our perception of universal order among material things, the mind may develop rational arguments for the existence of God.

As the disciplining of natural activities and of human thought are directly analogous functions of Plastic Nature, and are regulated by the same Essences, the logic of the human mind is always analogous to the natural order in the universe.  Where the Essences are represented in dumb matter by the laws of nature, they are represented in spirit by the activities in our mind which generate conceptions of those Essences.  Therefore, skepticism regarding the accuracy of human beliefs, as is manifest in Descartes’s “Evil Genius” thought experiment, is unjustified at this basic level.  The logic of our minds and the rationality of the universe are both emanations from the same source, and mirror each other.

iv. The Failings of Plastic Nature in Epistemology

However, after Plastic Nature has communicated the basic universals to the conscious mind, humans require more and more, at increasingly great levels of sophistication to develop these higher conceptions, unlike God, to whom they are innate. This opens the possibility of confusion or error.  For example, the conscious mind might simultaneously receive a message from its automatic epistemological processes, telling it that there is water on the horizon, and a second message from the reasoning spirit that this is a mirage.  When this occurs the problem has defeated our basic epistemological system, and the mind must choose which alternative to believe, settling the question with another faculty, the Will.

d. Free Will

Cudworth’s conception of the nature of the will is expressed in A Treatise on Freewill.  It is somewhat eccentric by the standard of his contemporaries.  To them, the human mind seems to be more the arena where will, intellect and the various passions constantly vie for power over the individual.  To Cudworth, it is far more orderly and integrated.

i. The Hegemonikon

He follows the Stoics, especially Epictetus and Iamblicus, in describing the mind as a “hegemonikon,” a conjunction of imagination, logic, passion and impulse.  According to Cudworth, the mind receives impulses from the reason, the body, and the instinctive drives of Plastic Nature in the way of a central repository.  Then it orders them, so that the whole can act as one coherent being.  It is the man …that understands, and the man that wills, as it is the man who walks, and the man that speaks or talks….”(A Treatise on Free Will, p. 25)…not merely the will, which is a product, not a component of the man.  This concept allowed for a recovery of the connection between body and mind, lost in Descartes’s dualism.  In effect, it posits what we might call the “personality” as a multi-leveled emergent locus of physical, conscious, and unconscious forces out of which psychological activity arises.

Will is the faculty which brings order to these mixed signals.  Plastic Nature links it to the most basic Essences.  These include the Essence of the Good.  So, included in its make-up is “the instinct to do good.”(A Treatise on Free Will, p. 4)  It tries to come up with the best internal order for the mind.  So, in cases where the intellect receives confused or mixed signals, the hegemonikon chooses which alternative to accept.  It is “free,” but it is not arbitrary.  It tries to arrive at the objectively right answer, but the very fact that it has been invoked means that there is no overwhelming influence determining which option to accept.

ii. God’s Choice

In some cases even the intellect of God is defeated, and is unable to discern which of a set of alternatives is better.  This is because Cudworth believes in a variety of Molina’s middle knowledge. To Cudworth, it is quite possible for two or more contradictory alternatives to really have equally forceful intellectual value.  Thus, there is no rational cause to prefer one option to the other.  In order to enact, or believe, one or the other option, the active intellect of God must have the ability to will an alternative without the guidance of predetermination.  So, God makes choices, when all of His alternatives are equally justified.  Fortunately, in God’s case, this only occurs when the alternatives actually are equally valid, so either option turns out to be perfectly right and good.

iii. Human Choice

Humans have a similar power.  But, due to the failings of our human epistemological method, sometimes we err.  In such cases, we only believe that the alternatives are all equally good, and engage the will, when the intellect alone should be enough to determine the appropriate alternative. When this happens, we might make the wrong choice, believing in the lesser truth, or performing the lesser act.  And so, moral and intellectual error enters the picture.  We are responsible for these errors because the balance of intellectual influences which required our will to act as a tie-breaker also eliminates the possibility for a predetermined solution.  We are the determining factor responsible for the action, event or belief produced.

5. Cudworth’s Influence

The Cambridge Platonists faded rather quickly from the English intellectual scene.  Most of the problems they attempted to solve were simply no longer of moment when the Restoration of the Monarchy forced a retreat of Calvinism. Also, Cudworth’s own vast erudition and the originality of his psychology were also lost in his bulky, inelegant style, controversial implications, and tendency towards mythmaking.
In 1703, Georges-Louis Le Clerc drew new attention to Cudworth, by publishing excerpts from the System.  This initiated a long debate between himself and Pierre Bayle over whether a belief in Plastic Nature could lead to atheism.  It also renewed interest in Cudworth and would eventually lead to the posthumous publications, and re-publications of his works.
Still, Cudworth’s philosophic influence is, for the most part, felt indirectly.  Damaris Cudworth Masham was a close friend to John Locke, and a correspondent with Gottfried Leibniz, whom she encouraged to publish.  Thus, parallels between Cudworth’s theories, and Locke’s seem to be no coincidence.  John Locke’s shares Cudworth’s conception of human free will, and his epistemological theory also adopts a model of the mind as an integrated collection of powers, faculties and modes.  Similarly, it may be observed that there are points of comparison between Cudworth’s conception of Plastic Nature, and Leibniz’s Theory of Pre-established Harmony.  Unfortunately, there has yet to be a complete study made of these connections.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Cragg, Gerald R. (ed.) 1968. The Cambridge Platonists. Oxford
  • Cudworth, Ralph, 1731. A Treatise on Eternal and Unalterable Morality. London
  • Cudworth, Ralph, 1996,  A Treatise on Free Will. Cambridge
  • Cudworth, Ralph, 1678, The True Intellectual System of the Universe. 3 vols. London
  • Patrides, C.A. 1969. The Cambridge Platonists. Cambridge

b. Secondary Sources

  • Birch, Thomas "An Account of the Life and Writings of R. Cudworth, D.D." in Cudworth, Works, 4 vols. (Oxford, 1829), 1, 7-37.
  • Carter, Benjamin. “Ralph Cudworth and the theological origins of consciousness,” in History of the Human Sciences July 2010 vol. 23 no. 3 29-47
  • Gysi, Lydia. Platonism and Cartesianism in the Philosophy of Cudworth (1962).
  • Lahteenmaki, Vili.  2010. “Cudworth on Types of Consciousness.” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 18 (1):9-34.
  • Mijuskovic, Ben Lazare. The Achilles of Rationalist Arguments. The Simplicity, Unity, and Identity of Thought and Soul from the Cambridge Platonists to Kant: A Study in the History of an Argument (International Archives of the History of ideas, Series Minor 13). The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1974.
  • Muirhead, John H. The Platonic Tradition in Anglo-Saxon Philosophy (1931). New York
  • Osborne, Catherine. 'Ralph Cudworth's The True Intellectual System of the Universe and the Presocratic Philosophers', in Oliver Primavesi and Katharina Luchner (eds) The Presocratics from the Latin Middle Ages to Hermann Diels (Steiner Verlag 2011)
  • Passmore, John Arthur. Ralph Cudworth: An Interpretation, University Press, University of Michigan (1951).
  • Rodney, Joel M. "A Godly Atomist in 17th-Century England: Ralph Cudworth," The Historian 32 (1970), 243-9.
  • Tulloch, J. “Rational Theology and Christian Philosophy in England in the Seventeenth Century,” reprint of 2nd ed., 2 vols. (New York, 1972), 2, 193-302. BR756 T919 Dictionary of National Biography (repr., London: Oxford University Press, 1949-1950), 5, 271-2. Biographia Britannica, 2nd ed. (London, 1778-93), 4, 544-9.


Author Information

Charles M. Richards
Tulsa Community College, Rogers State University
U. S. A.

17th Century Theories of Substance

In contemporary, everyday language, the word “substance” tends to be a generic term used to refer to various kinds of material stuff (“we need to clean this sticky substance off the floor”) or as an adjective referring to something’s mass, size, or importance (“that is a substantial bookcase”).  In 17th century philosophical discussion, however, this term’s meaning is only tangentially related to our everyday use of the term.  For 17th century philosophers the term  is reserved for the ultimate constituents of reality on which everything else depends.  This article discusses the most important theories of substance from the 17th century: those of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz.  Although these philosophers were highly original thinkers, they shared a basic conception of substance inherited from the scholastic-Aristotelian tradition from which philosophical thinking was emerging.  In a general sense each of these theories is a way of working out dual commitments: a commitment to substance as an ultimate subject and a commitment to the existence of God as a substance.  In spite of these systematic similarities between the theories, they ultimately offer very different accounts of the nature of substance.  Given the foundational role substance plays in the metaphysical schemes of these thinkers, it will not be surprising to find that these theories of substance underlie dramatically different accounts of the nature and structure of reality.

Table of Contents

  1. 17th Century Theories of Substance: A Shared Background
  2. Descartes
    1. Descartes’ Account of Substance
    2. What Substances are There?
    3. Are Embodied Human Beings Substances?
    4. How is Substance Independent?
    5. How Many Material Substances?
  3. Spinoza
    1. Spinoza’s Account of Substance
    2. What Substances are There?
    3. Why doesn’t Spinoza Countenance Created Substance?
    4. How Can a Substance Have More than One Attribute?
    5. An Extended and Indivisible Substance?
  4. Leibniz
    1. Leibniz’s Account of Substances
    2. What Substances are There?
    3. Experience and Reality
    4. What is Wrong with Composite Beings?
    5. Leibniz and Spinoza
  5. 17th Century Theories of Substance in Perspective
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Texts in English
    2. Secondary Texts

1. 17th Century Theories of Substance: A Shared Background

In thinking about 17th century accounts of substance we need to keep in mind that a concern with substance and its nature was nothing new to the period. In fact, philosophical thinking about the nature of substance stretches all the way back to ancient Greece.  While the new philosophers of the 17th century were keen to make a break with the past and to tackle philosophical and scientific problems from new foundations, their views did not develop in an intellectual vacuum.  Indeed, the scholastic-Aristotelian tradition of the day informed their thinking about substance in a number of ways, and contributed to a number of commonalities in their thought. Before looking at specific theories of substance, it is important to note four commonalities in particular.

Substance, Mode, Inherence

For the philosophers we will discuss, at the very deepest level the universe contains only two kinds or categories of entity: substances and modes.  Generally speaking, modes are ways that things are; thus shape (for example being a rectangle), color (for example redness), and size (for example length) are paradigm modes.  As a way a thing is, a mode stands in a special relationship with that of which it is a way.  Following a tradition reaching back to Aristotle’s Categories, modes are said to exist in, or inhere in, a subject.  Similarly, a subject is said to have or bear modes.  Thus we might say that a door is the subject in which the mode of rectangularity inheres.  One mode might exist in another mode (a color might have a particular hue, for example), but ultimately all modes exist in something which is not itself a mode, that is, in a substance.  A substance, then, is an ultimate subject.

Independence and Priority

The new philosophers of the 17th century follow tradition in associating inherence with dependence.  They all agree that the existence of a mode is dependent in a way that the existence of a substance is not.  The idea is that modes, as the ways that things are, depend for their existence on that of which they are modes, e.g. there is no mode of ‘being 8’0 long’ without there being a subject that is 8’0 long.  Put otherwise, the view is that the existence of a mode ultimately requires or presupposes the existence of a substance.  This point is sometimes put by saying that substances, as subjects, are metaphysically prior to modes.

Degrees of Reality

In contrast to contemporary philosophers, most 17th century philosophers held that reality comes in degrees—that some things that exist are more or less real than other things that exist.  At least part of what dictates a being’s reality, according to these philosophers, is the extent to which its existence is dependent on other things: the less dependent a thing is on other things for its existence, the more real it is.  Given that there are only substances and modes, and that modes depend on substances for their existence, it follows that substances are the most real constituents of reality.

God Exists and is a Substance

Furthermore, each of the philosophers we will discuss maintains (and offer arguments on behalf of the claim) that God exists, and that God’s existence is absolutely independent.  It is not surprising then, given the above, that each of these philosophers holds that God is a substance par excellence.

2. Descartes

Descartes’ philosophical system, including his account of substance was extremely influential during the 17th century.  For more details see the IEP entry René Descartes: Overview.  Unlike Spinoza and Leibniz, however, Descartes’ theory of substance was not the centerpiece of his philosophical system.  Nonetheless, Descartes offered a novel theory of substance which diverged in important ways from the Scholastic-Aristotelian tradition.

a. Descartes’ Account of Substance

It is sometimes said that Descartes gives two different definitions of substance, and indeed in the Principles and Second Replies he defines substance in distinct ways.  We should not, however, see this as evidence that Descartes changed his mind.  On the contrary, it is clear that for Descartes these definitions express two sides of a unified account of substance.

Let us begin with the definition he offers in his Principles of Philosophy (I.51-52).  There he defines ‘substance’ in terms of independence.  He begins by making clear that there are really two different philosophical senses of the term (corresponding to two degrees of independence).  For reasons that will become clear in a moment, let us distinguish the two senses by calling one Substance and the other Created Substance.  Descartes’ definitions can be paraphrased as follows:

Substance: A thing whose existence is dependent on no other thing.

Created Substance: A thing whose existence is dependent on nothing other than God.

Strictly speaking, for Descartes there is only one Substance (as opposed to Created Substance), since there is only one thing whose existence is independent of all other things: God.  However, within the universe that God has created there are entities the existence of which depends only on God.  These lesser substances are the ultimate constituents of the created world.

The definition of substance that Descartes offers in the Second Replies (and elsewhere), ignores the distinction between God and creation and defines substance in a much more traditional way, claiming that a substance is a subject that has or bears modes, but is not itself a mode of anything else.  This fits right in with his other comments about substance in the Principles.  Thus, he tells us that each created substance has exactly one attribute (Principles I. 53).  An attribute of a substance, Descartes explains, is its “principle property which constitutes its nature and essence, and to which all its other properties are referred” (Ibid.).  A substance’s attribute, consequently, dictates its kind since attributes “constitute” a substance’s nature and all and only those things of the same nature are of the same kind.  Moreover, in claiming that all a substance’s properties are referred through the substance’s attribute, Descartes is claiming that a substance’s attribute dictates the properties that a substance may have.

Descartes specifies two attributes: thought and extension.  Consequently, there are at least two kinds of created substance—extended substances and thinking substances.  By ‘extension’ Descartes just means having length, breadth, and depth.  More colloquially we might say that to be extended is just to take up space or to have volume.  Whereas by ‘thinking substance’ Descartes just means ‘mind’.  Although Descartes only ever discusses these two attributes, he never explicitly rules out the possibility of other attributes.  Nevertheless, the tradition has interpreted Descartes as holding that there are only two kinds of created substance and it is for this reason that Descartes is often called a substance dualist.

With this specification in hand we are in a better position to understand what Descartes means when he says that all a substance’s properties are referred through the substance’s attribute or “principle property.”  Consider an extended substance, say, a particular rock.  Among this rock’s properties are shape and size; but having these properties presupposes the property of extension.  Put otherwise, something cannot have a shape or a size without also being extended.  Furthermore, the properties that the rock may have are limited to modifications of extension—a rock cannot have the property of experiencing pain for example, since the property of experiencing pain is not a way of being extended.   In general, we can say that for Descartes i) the attribute of a substance is its most general property, and that ii) every other property of a substance is merely a specification of, way of being, or mode of that attribute.

b. What Substances are There?

Given this account of the nature of substance, what substances exist?  Descartes famously argues in Meditation Six that human minds and bodies are really distinct—that is, that they are each substances.  Indeed, every individual consciousness or mind is a thinking substance.  Furthermore Descartes treats bodies, including the objects of our everyday experience (chairs, trees, spoons, etc.) as extended substances. This makes sense: extension is an attribute of substance, so it would seem to follow that anything that is extended (has the attribute of extension) is itself a substance.  Moreover the parts of extended substances, as themselves extended, would seem to be extended substances for Descartes (see Principles I. 60). Given that Descartes thinks that matter is infinitely divisible (Principles II. 20)—that each part of matter is itself extended all the way down—it follows that there are an infinite number of extended substances.

We are thus left with the following picture of reality.  The most real thing is God on which all other things depend.  However, within the created realm there are entities that are independent of everything besides God.  These are the created substances.  Created substances come in two kinds—extended substances and minds, and there is a plurality of both.

This brief summary of Descartes’ account of substance raises a number of deeper questions and controversies.  One central question that naturally arises is why Descartes thinks that extension and thought are the most general properties of substances.  For a detailed discussion of Descartes’ reasons see the IEP entry René Descartes: The Mind-Body Distinction. This entry will briefly consider the role of embodied human beings in Descartes metaphysics, what Descartes means in calling substances independent, and a related controversy concerning the number of material substances to which Descartes is entitled.

c. Are Embodied Human Beings Substances?

Embodied human beings fit uneasily into Descartes’ metaphysics.  As embodied, humans are composite beings; an embodied human being consists of a mental substance (our mind) and a physical one (our body), for Descartes.  Descartes thinks that this composite being is, however, something over and above a mere aggregation.  He writes in Mediation Six: “Nature also teaches me…that I am not merely present in my body as a sailor is present in a ship, but that I am very closely joined and, as it were, intermingled with it, so that I and the body form a unit” (my italics).  In general, it is clear that Descartes thinks that embodied humans are exceptional beings in some regard, but how we should understand this mind/body union and its place in Descartes’ metaphysics has been a matter of some controversy among scholars.  One of the more prominent disputes has been between those scholars who read Descartes as holding that embodied human beings are a distinct kind of created substance, and those scholars who do not.  The former see Descartes as a substance trialist, whereas the latter read him along traditional lines as a substance dualist.  For trialist readings see Hoffman 1986 and Skirry 2005: Chapter 4).  For recent defenses of substance dualism against trialist interpretations see Kaufman 2008 and Zaldivar 2011.

d. How is Substance Independent?

As we have seen, Descartes defines substance in terms of independence.  This, however, is only a very general claim.  In order to better understand Descartes’ account of substance we need to have a better idea of the way in which substances are independent.  On one hand, in his thinking about substance Descartes is working with the traditional conception of independence according to which a substance’s existence is independent in a way that a mode’s existence is not, since substances are ultimate subjects.  Accordingly, let us say that substances are subject-independent.  On the other hand, in his account of substance Descartes is also working with a causal sense of independence.  After all, the reason that God is the only Substance (as opposed to Created Substance) is that all other things “can exist only with the help of God’s concurrence” (Principles I.51), and Descartes understands this as the causal claim that all other things are God’s creation and require his continual conservation.  Consequently scholars have seen Descartes as holding that in general i) God is both causally and subjectively independent (God is not, after all, a mode of anything else), ii) created substances are causally independent of everything but God and subjectively independent, and iii) modes are both causally and subjectively dependent in that they both depend on God’s continual conservation and on created substances as subjects. (See for example, Markie 1994: 69; Rodriguez-Pereyra 2008: 79-80)

e. How Many Material Substances?

That created substances are causally independent of everything but God suggests a startling conclusion—that despite what Descartes seems to say, bodies are not material substances, since they are not sufficiently independent.  Bodies are causally dependent on other bodies in a host of different ways.  For example, bodies come to be and are destroyed by other bodies: a person is the product of  their parents and could die as the result of getting hit by a car.  Indeed, according to one scholarly tradition, there is only one material thing that satisfies Descartes’ definition of created substance—the material universe as a whole (see for example, Cottingham 1986: 84-85).  Again, following tradition we can call this view the Monist Interpretation, and the opposing view that there are many material substances, the Pluralist Interpretation (for a distinct view see Woolhouse 1993: 22-23).  It would appear, then, that there is philosophical evidence of Monism; in other words, it would seem that Descartes’ views about created substance commit him to thinking there can be only one material substance.  Proponents of this interpretation claim that there is textual evidence as well, pointing to a passage in the Synopsis to the Meditations.  There Descartes writes:

[W]e need to recognize that body, taken in the general sense, is a substance, so that it too never perishes.  But the human body, in so far as it differs from other bodies, is simply made up of a certain configuration of limbs and other accidents of this sort; whereas the human mind is not made up of any accidents in this way, but is a pure substance.

Monists read ‘body, taken in the general sense’ as referring to the material universe as a whole.  Consequently, they see this passage as claiming that the material universe is a substance, but that the human body is not—since it is made up on a configuration of limbs and accidents.   Assuming the monists are right, two questions immediately arise.  First, if bodies are not substances, then what are they?  Monists typically claim that bodies are modes.  This makes sense: if bodies are not substances, they must be modes, given Descartes’ ontology.  Second, if Descartes does not think that bodies are substances, why does he so often talk as if they are?  Monists answer that Descartes is speaking loosely in these contexts using the term ‘substance’ in a secondary or derivative sense of the term.

Pluralists have objected on a number of grounds.  First, pluralists have challenged the monist’s textual evidence, offering alternative readings of the Synopsis.  Second, they have challenged the motivation of monism, pointing out that the monist interpretation requires a very strong conception of causal independence, and that it just isn’t clear that this is Descartes’ view. Third, pluralists note that although Descartes writes of bodies as substances on numerous occasions, he never clearly refers to them as modes.  Last, pluralists have denied that Descartes could have held that bodies are modes noting that for Descartes i) parts of things are not modes of them and ii) bodies are parts of the material universe.  Hoffman 1986 briefly raises each of these objections.  For more lengthy discussions see Skirry 2005: Chapter 3 and Slowik 2001.

3. Spinoza

Spinoza’s most important work is his Ethics Demonstrated in Geometric Order—henceforth the Ethics. Spinoza worked on the text throughout the 1660s and 70s.  By this time Descartes’ philosophy had become widely read and indeed Spinoza’s thinking was heavily influenced by it—including his account of substance.  Nevertheless, Spinoza’s account diverges in important ways and leads to a radically different picture of the world.

a. Spinoza’s Account of Substance

Spinoza offers a definition of substance on the very first page of the Ethics.  He writes:  “By substance I understand what is in itself and is conceived through itself... “ (E1d3).  Spinoza follows Descartes (and the tradition) in defining substance as “in itself” or as an ultimate subject.  Correspondingly, he follows the tradition in defining ‘mode’ as that which is had or borne by another; as Spinoza puts it a mode is “that which is in another…” (E1d5).  For a discussion of the scholastic-Aristotelian roots of Spinoza’s definition see Carriero 1995.  Spinoza also follows Descartes in thinking that i) attributes are the principle properties of substance, ii) among those attributes are thought and extension, iii) all other properties of a substance are referred through, or are ways of being, that attribute, and iv) God exists and is a substance.  Here the agreement ends.

The first obvious divergence from Descartes is found at E1P5.  For Descartes there are many extended substances (at least on the pluralist interpretation) and many minds.  Spinoza, however, thinks this is dead wrong.  At E1P5 Spinoza argues that substance is unique in its kind—there can be only one substance per attribute.  This fact about substance (in combination with a number of other metaphysical theses) has far-reaching consequences for his account of substance.

It follows, Spinoza argues at E1P6, that to be a substance is to be causally isolated, on the grounds that i) there is only one substance per kind or attribute and ii) causal relations can obtain only between things of the same kind.  Causal isolation does not, however, entail causal impotence.  An existing substance must have a cause in some sense, but as causally isolated its cause cannot lie in anything outside itself.  Spinoza concludes that substance “will be the cause of itself…it pertains to the nature of a substance to exist” (E1P7).  Not only is a substance the cause of itself, but Spinoza later tells us that it is the immanent cause of everything that is in it (E1P18).  Spinoza continues, in E1P8, by claiming that “every substance is necessarily infinite.”  In general Spinoza argues that if there is only one substance per attribute, then substance cannot be limited since limitation is a causal notion and substances are causally isolated.  Last, Spinoza makes the case that substances are indivisible.  He argues in E1P12-13 that if substance were divisible, it would be divisible either into parts of the same nature or parts of a different nature.  If the former, then there would be more than one substance of the same nature which is ruled out by E1P5.  If the latter, then the substance could cease to exist which is ruled out by E1P7; consequently substance cannot be divided.

b. What Substances are There?

Given this account of the nature of substance, what substances exist?  From what has been said so far in the Ethics it would be reasonable to suppose that, for Spinoza, reality consists of the following substances: God, one extended substance, one thinking substance, and one substance for every further attribute, should there be any.  As it turns out, however, this is only partially right.  It is true that Spinoza ultimately holds that God exists, that there is one extended substance, and one thinking substance.  However, Spinoza denies that these are different substances. The one thinking substance is numerically identical to the one extended substance which is numerically identical to God.  Put otherwise, there is only one substance, God, and that substance is both extended and thinking.

Spinoza’s official argument for this conclusion is at E1P14.  He argues as follows: God exists (which was proven at E1P11).  Given that God is defined as a being that possesses all the attributes (E1d6) and that there is only one substance per attribute (E1P5), it follows that God is the only substance.  For a detailed discussion of this argument see the IEP entry Spinoza: Metaphysics.

Given that God is the only substance and Spinoza’s substance/mode ontology, it follows that the material objects of our experience are not independently existing substances, but instead are modes of the one extended substance.  So too, minds which Descartes had thought of as thinking substances are, according to Spinoza, modes of the attribute of thought.

We are thus left with the following picture of reality.  Like Descartes, Spinoza holds that the most real thing is God on which all other things depend.  However, there are no created substances.  God as the one substance has all the attributes, and consequently is both an extended substance and a thinking one.  What Descartes had taken for created substances are actually modes of God.  Nevertheless, Spinoza agrees with Descartes that the contents of reality come in two kinds—modes of extension and modes of thought, and there is a plurality of both.

This account of the nature of substance yields a very different picture of the metaphysical structure of the world from Descartes (and from common sense).  This entry will focus on three questions in particular: i) why doesn’t Spinoza accept created substances, ii) how can a substance have more than one attribute, and iii) how can a substance be indivisible as Spinoza suggests?

c. Why doesn’t Spinoza Countenance Created Substance?

Spinoza will not countenance Descartes’ distinction between Substance and Created Substance for a number of reasons.  First, created substances are the causal products of God.  However, substances are causally isolated, and so even if there were multiple substances, one could not be the causal product of the other.  Second, as we have seen Descartes holds that despite their causal dependence on God, finite minds and bodies warrant the name ‘substance’ at least partially because such beings are ultimate subjects.  Spinoza agrees that being an ultimate subject is an essential part of being a substance; the problem is that finite bodies and minds are not ultimate subjects.  Spinoza’s official grounds for this thesis are found in the arguments for E1P4 and 5.  In general, Spinoza claims that what is distinctive of substances as ultimate subjects is that they can be individuated by attribute alone.  According to Spinoza there are only two kinds of mark by which entities might be individuated—by attribute and by mode.  Substances as ultimate subjects cannot be individuated by mode, since subjects are metaphysically prior to modes.  Two finite bodies, for example, are not individuated by attribute (since they are both extended) and so cannot be substances.

d. How Can a Substance Have More than One Attribute?

As we’ve seen, for Descartes each substance has one—and only one—attribute.  Spinoza’s argument for substance monism, on the other hand, claims that there is a substance that possesses all the attributes.  Spinoza justifies this move defensively; at E1P10s Spinoza claims that nothing we know about the attributes entails that they must belong to different substances, and consequently there is nothing illegitimate about claiming that a substance may have more than one attribute.  Although this is Spinoza’s stated defense, a number of scholars have claimed that Spinoza has the philosophical resources to make a much stronger argument.  Specifically, they claim he has a positive case that, in fact, a substance possessing anything less than all the attributes (and hence, just one) is impossible.  In brief Lin 2007 asks us to suppose that Spinoza is wrong, and that it is possible for there to be a substance that has fewer than all of the attributes (but at least one).  Spinoza is a strong proponent of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (see for example, E1P8s2) according to which there is an explanation for every fact.  Given the PSR it follows that there is an explanation of why the substance in question fails to have all the attributes.  However, any such explanation will have to appeal to the substance’s existing attribute (or attributes).  Attributes are conceptually independent however, and consequently one cannot appeal to an existing attribute to explain the absence of another.  For a different but closely related version of this argument see Della Rocca 2002.

e. An Extended and Indivisible Substance?

Unlike Descartes, Spinoza holds that substance is indivisible, and this raises a number of questions about the consistency of Spinoza’s account of substance.  For example, how is substance’s indivisibility consistent with Spinoza’s claims that (i) substance has many attributes which constitute its essence and (ii) that substance is extended?  For a discussion of i) see the IEP entry Spinoza: Metaphysics.  Here the focus is on ii).

Spinoza’s extended substance, or God considered under the attribute of extension, is normally understood as encompassing the whole of extended reality (though for an alternative see Woolhouse 1990).  According to a philosophical tradition going back at least to Plato’s Phaedo, to be extended or corporeal is to have parts, to be divisible, and hence to be corruptible.  Spinoza, however, holds that “it pertains to the nature of substance to exist.”  Consequently, it would seem to follow that Spinoza cannot consistently hold that substance is extended.  Spinoza was well aware of this argument and his official rejoinder is found in E1P15s.  The problem with the argument is that it is “founded only on [the] supposition that corporeal substance is composed of parts.”  On its face, this is a confusing claim—if extended or corporeal substance just is the whole of extended reality, it surely has parts.  For example, there is the part of extension which constitutes an individual human body, a part which constitutes the Atlantic Ocean, a part that constitutes Earth, etc.  Despite his wording, Spinoza is not denying that extended substance has parts in every sense of the term.  Rather, Spinoza is especially concerned to counter the idea that his extended substance is a composite substance, built out of parts which are themselves substances, and into which it might be divided or resolved.  This makes sense, since a) it is not having parts that is the problem, but being corruptible, and b) this account of extended substance as divisible into further extended substances is just what Descartes (one of the main influences on Spinoza’s thought) seems to have held.

Spinoza makes his case in two ways in E1P15s.  First, Spinoza points us back to the arguments at E1P12 and 13 for the indivisibility of substance.  Second Spinoza offers a new argument that focuses specifically on extended substance, one that, interestingly, does not presuppose the prior apparatus of the Ethics.  In putting aside his own previous conclusions, Spinoza’s apparent goal is to show that a view like Descartes’ according to which any extended substance has parts which are themselves extended substances, fails on its own terms.  In general, he argues as follows.  Consider an extended substance, say a wheel of cheese.  If the parts of this wheel are themselves extended substances, then it is—at least in principle—possible for one or more of the parts to be annihilated without any consequence for the other parts.  The idea here is that because substances are independent subjects, the annihilation of one subject cannot have any consequence for the others.  Suppose then that the middle of our wheel of cheese is annihilated; we are thus left with a “donut” of cheese.  The problem with this is that the hole in the cheese is measurable—it has a diameter, a circumference, etc.  In short, it is extended.  However, we have supposed that the extended substance—the subject of the extension—in the middle was destroyed.  We are thus left with an instance of attribute, extension, without a substance as its subject—an impossibility by both Descartes’ and Spinoza’s standards.  For detailed discussions of this argument see Huenemann 1997 and Robinson 2009.

4. Leibniz

Leibniz’s views were informed by the accounts of both Descartes and Spinoza.  In fact, Leibniz corresponded with Spinoza during the early 1670s and briefly visited with Spinoza in 1676.  Unlike Spinoza, Leibniz did not write a single authoritative account of his metaphysical system.  Not only that, but his metaphysical views changed in significant ways over his lifetime.  Nevertheless, it is possible to identify a core account of the nature of substance that runs throughout his middle to later works (from the Discourse on Metaphysics of 1686 through the Monadology of 1714).

a. Leibniz’s Account of Substances

Substances are independent and are ultimate subjects.

Like Descartes, Leibniz thinks that God is the only absolutely independent thing, and that there are, in addition, created substances which are “like a world apart, independent of all other things, except for God” (Discourse on Metaphysics §8).  Second, Leibniz explicitly agrees with Descartes, Spinoza, and the tradition in maintaining that substances are the ultimate bearers of modes or properties.  He writes “when several predicates are attributed to a single subject and this subject is attributed to no others, it is called an individual substance” (Ibid.).

Substances are unities.

To be a unity for Leibniz is to be simple and without parts, and so the ultimate constituents of reality are not composite or aggregative beings. That substances are simple has metaphysically significant consequences; Leibniz infers in the Principles of Nature and Grace and elsewhere that “Since the monads have no parts, they can neither be formed nor destroyed.  They can neither begin nor end naturally, and consequently they last as long as the universe.”  A being comes to be naturally only as the result of a composition; an entity is destroyed naturally only through dissolution or corruption.  Thus only composite entities are naturally generable or destructible.  Leibniz emphasizes, however, that substances’ unity and consequent simplicity is entirely consistent with the possession of and changes in modes or properties.

Substances are active.

To say that a substance is active is to say not only that it is causally efficacious, but that it is the ultimate (created) source of its own actions. Thus he writes, “every substance has a perfect spontaneity…that everything that happens to it is a consequence of its idea or of its being, and that nothing determines it, except God alone” (DM §32).  Substances, in some sense, have their entire history written into their very nature.  The history of each substance unfolds successively, each state causally following from the previous state according to laws.  From this it follows that if we had perfect knowledge of a substance’s state at a time and of the laws of causal succession, we could foresee the entire life of the substance.  As Leibniz elegantly put the point in the Principles of Nature and Grace “the present is pregnant with the future; the future can be read in the past; the distant is expressed in the proximate.”

Substances are causally isolated.

Like Spinoza, Leibniz holds both that substances are causally efficacious, and that their efficacy does not extend to other substances.  In other words, although there is intra-substantial causation (insofar as substances cause their own states), there is no inter-substantial causation.  Leibniz offers a number of different arguments for this claim.  On some occasions he argues that causal isolation follows from the nature of substance.  If a state of a substance could be the causal effect of some other substance, then a substance’s spontaneity and independence would be compromised.  Elsewhere he argues that inter-substantial causation is itself impossible, claiming that the only way that one substance might cause another is through the actual transfer of accidents or properties.  Thus Leibniz famously writes that substances “have no windows through which something can enter or leave.  Accidents cannot be detached, nor can they go about outside of substances” (Monadology §7).  For a more detailed discussion of Leibniz’s views of causation see the IEP entry Leibniz: Causation.

b. What Substances are There?

Although Leibniz agrees with Descartes that God is an infinite substance which created and conserves the finite world, he disagrees about the fundamental constituents of this world.  For Descartes there are fundamentally two kinds of finite substance—thinking substances or minds and extended substances or bodies.  Leibniz disagrees; according to Leibniz (and this is especially clear in the later works) there are no extended substances.  Nothing extended can be a substance since nothing that is extended is a unity.  To be extended is to be actually divided into parts, according to Leibniz, and consequently to be an aggregate.  The ultimate created substances, for Leibniz, are much more like Cartesian thinking substances, and indeed Leibniz refers to simple substances as “minds” or “souls.”  This terminology can be confusing, and it is important to be clear that in using these terms Leibniz is not thereby claiming that all simple substances are individual human consciousnesses (although human consciousnesses are simple substances for Leibniz).  Rather, there is a whole spectrum of simple substances of which human minds are a particularly sophisticated example.

We are thus left with the following picture of reality.  God exists and is responsible for creating and continually conserving everything else.  The ultimate constituents of reality are monads which are indivisible and unextended minds or mind-like substances.  Although monads are causally isolated, they have properties or qualities that continually change, and these changes are dictated by the monad’s nature itself.  Leibniz’s account of substance and his metaphysics in general, raise a number of questions.  This article will take up three in particular.  First, Leibniz’s account of substance yields (in conjunction with a number of other metaphysical commitments) a picture of reality that diverges in significant ways both from common sense and from Descartes and Spinoza.  How does our experience of an extended world of causal interaction fit into Leibniz’s metaphysical picture?  Second, that substances are unities is a crucial feature of Leibniz’s account, and it is important to consider why Leibniz is so opposed to composite substances.  Last, Spinoza and Leibniz offer very similar accounts of substance, yet end up with very different metaphysical pictures, and so this article will consider where Leibniz’s account diverges from Spinoza’s.

c. Experience and Reality

How does the world of our experience fit into Leibniz’s account of reality?  Our everyday experience is of extended objects causally interacting, but for Leibniz at the fundamental level there is no inter-substantial causation and there are no extended substances.  How, then, is the world of our experience related to the world as it really is?

Let us begin with the apparent causal relations between things.  Recall that, for Leibniz, monads are active and spontaneous.  Each individual human mind is a monad, and this means that all of a human’s experiences—including their sensations of the world—are the effects of their own previous states.  For example, a person’s sensation of a book’s being on the desk is not caused by the book (or the light bouncing off the book, entering the eye,…etc.) but is rather a progression in the unfolding of the history written into the person’s nature.  Although a monad’s life originates from its nature alone, God has created the world so that the lives of created monads perfectly correspond.  Leibniz writes in A New System of Nature,

God originally created the soul (and any other real unity) in such a way that everything must arise for it from its own depths…yet with a perfect conformity relative to external things...There will be a perfect agreement among all these substances, producing the same effect that would be noticed if they communicated through the transmission of species or qualities, as the common philosophers imagine they do.

Thus, when Katie walks around the corner and sees Beatrice, and Beatrice sees Katie, they do so because it was written into Katie’s very nature that she would see Beatrice, and into Beatrice’s nature that she would see Katie.  This is Leibniz’s famous doctrine of pre-established harmony.  For more see the IEP entry Leibniz: Metaphysics.

How does our experience of an extended world of bodies arise? To start, Leibniz certainly doesn’t think that bodies are built out of, or are composites of, monads.  Thus he writes in his Notes on Comments by Michel Angelo Fardella, “just as a point is not a part of a line…so also a soul is not a part of matter.”  Instead in many cases Leibniz characterizes bodies as phenomena or appearances.  He writes in an oft-cited passage to DeVolder:

[M]atter and motion are not substances or things as much as they are the phenomena of perceivers, the reality of which is situated in the harmony of the perceivers with themselves (at different times) and with other perceivers.

Leibniz seems to be saying here and elsewhere that bodies are merely appearances (albeit shared appearances) that do not correspond to any mind-independent reality, and indeed a number of scholars have claimed that this is Leibniz’s considered view (see for example, Loeb  1981: 299-309).  In other texts however Leibniz claims that bodies result from, or are founded in, aggregates of monads, and this suggests that bodies are something over and above the mere perceptions of monads.  In general, scholars have offered interpretations that attempt to accommodate both sets of texts and which see bodies as being aggregates of monads that are perceived as being extended.  There is a great deal of debate, however, about how such aggregates might ultimately be related to bodies and their perception (for one account see Rutherford 1995b: 143-153).

d. What is Wrong with Composite Beings?

Leibniz thinks composite beings are excluded as possible substances on a number of grounds.  First, no composite is (or can be) a unity, since according to Leibniz there is no way that two or more entities might be united into a single one.  He famously illustrates this claim by appealing to two diamonds.  He writes in his Letters to Arnauld: “One could impose the same collective name for the two…although they are far part from one another; but one would not say that these two diamonds constitute a substance…Even if they were brought nearer together and made to touch, they would not be substantially united to any greater extent… contact, common motion, and participation in a common plan have no effect on substantial unity.”  In general, there is no relation that two or more entities might be brought into that would unify them into a single being.

A second and perhaps even deeper problem with composites is that according to Leibniz they cannot be ultimate subjects. He writes, again in the Letters to Arnauld, “It also seems that what constitutes the essence of a being by aggregation is only a mode of things of which it is composed.  For example, what constitutes the essence of an army is only a mode of the men who compose it.”  Leibniz’s claim is that no aggregate is a substance because aggregates are modes or states of their parts, and no mode is an ultimate subject.  This leaves us with a question, however: why does Leibniz think that aggregates are mere modes or states of their parts?  In his influential book R.C. Sleigh (1990: 123-124) makes the case that Leibniz’s grounds for thinking aggregates are modes is that aggregates are semantically and ontologically dispensable.  That is, everything that is true of an aggregate can be expressed by attributing various modes to the parts, all without appealing to the aggregate itself.  This tells us that that all of an aggregate’s purported modes are in fact modes of the parts, and that consequently the aggregate is not an ultimate subject.  Given a substance/mode ontology, it follows that to the extent that aggregates exist, they must be modes.

e. Leibniz and Spinoza

Although Spinoza and Leibniz offer very different pictures of the structure of reality, their respective accounts of substance overlap in important ways: both agree that to be a substance is to be at least i) an ultimate subject, ii) causally isolated but causally efficacious, and iii) indivisible.  Indeed, a number of scholars have suggested that Leibniz briefly adopted or was at least tempted by a Spinozistic metaphysics early in his philosophical career (see for example, the discussion in Adams 1994: 123-130).  Even later in life Leibniz seems to have held Spinoza’s views in high regard saying in a Letter to Louis Bourguet that “[A]ccording to Spinoza…there is only one substance.  He would be right if there were no monads.”  Given this it is worth considering where Leibniz breaks with Spinoza and why.

Although they differ in a number of important ways, perhaps the most prominent difference between the metaphysics of Spinoza and Leibniz is that Leibniz holds that reality is split into two: God and creation.  God is a substance and He produces finite substances—created monads.  This signals a break from Spinoza in at least two significant ways.  First, it means that Leibniz’s agreement with Spinoza about the causal isolation of substances applies only to created substances; although for Leibniz God is a substance, He is not causally isolated.  Recall that at least one of Leibniz’s reasons for denying inter-substantial causation is that it would require the actual transfer of properties or accidents, and that such a transfer is impossible.  Jolley (2005) makes the case that, for Leibniz, God’s causal activity is of a different kind.  God does not produce effects in a metaphysically intolerable way, and consequently, God need not be causally isolated.

Second, Leibniz holds, in contrast to Spinoza, that created substances are ultimate subjects.  Leibniz is very explicit about his objection to Spinoza on this score.  Although he agrees that substances require individuation, he holds that Spinoza’s proof at E1P5 that there can be only one substance per nature or attribute is unsound.  Furthermore Leibniz holds that Monads can be individuated, ultimately claiming in the Monadology that “Monads…are…differentiated by the degrees of their distinct perceptions.”

5. 17th Century Theories of Substance in Perspective

Looking back we might see Descartes, but especially Spinoza and Leibniz, as working through the metaphysical consequences of holding that substances are ultimate subjects.  More generally, we can see these theories of substance as different ways of trying to reconcile the notion of substance as an ultimate subject with a commitment to God’s existence and independence.

Epistemological considerations led prominent late 17th and 18th century philosophers to abandon such questions, and to give substance a much more modest position in their metaphysical systems.  John Locke, for example, holds that there are substances and that they are ultimate subjects, but is wary of drawing any further conclusions.  As Locke famously claims, “if any one will examine himself concerning his Notion of pure Substance in general, he will find he has no other Idea of it at all, but only a Supposition of he knows not what support of such Qualities...commonly called Accidents” (EHU 2.23.2).  David Hume goes further claiming that it is not within out power to know the ultimate structure of reality, and that further that our idea of a substance as a subject is merely the result of our imagination: “the imagination is apt to feign something unknown and invisible, which it supposes to continue the same under all these variations; and this unintelligible something it calls a substance” (Treatise 1.4.3).  Humean skepticism about substance (and about metaphysics more generally) survives in one form or another to the present day.

Of course not everyone agrees with this tradition, and the nature of substance has been a question that many contemporary philosophers have taken up—albeit from different starting points than Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz.  Unlike the 17th century, in contemporary philosophical use the term ‘substance’ is not necessarily intended to refer to the ultimate constituents of reality (although it may).  Rather the term is usually taken to refer to what are sometimes called “concrete particulars”, that is, to individual material things or objects.  Furthermore, among contemporary philosophers there is nothing like the consensus that we find among the 17th century philosophers regarding ontology, dependence, reality, and God.  Thus, it is commonly held that there are categories of reality beyond substance and mode (or property), perhaps most prominently events or processes.  Many philosophers have questioned both the relation of inherence and the connection between inherence and ontological dependence (bundle-theories of substance, for example, deny that substances are subjects at all—they are merely bundles or collections of properties).  Furthermore, most contemporary philosophers deny that it makes sense to talk about degrees of reality: things are either real or not.  Last, and perhaps most obviously, contemporary philosophers no longer agree that God exists and is a substance.  For a contemporary effort to offer an account of substance that is in the spirit of 17th century discussions see Hoffman and Rosenkrantz 1997.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Texts in English

  • Descartes
  • John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny ed. and trans. The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 3 vols., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984-1991.
    • This is the standard English edition of Descartes’ work.
  • Spinoza
  • Edwin Curley, trans. and ed. The Collected Works of Spinoza Vol. 1. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985.
    • This is the standard English translation.
  • Leibniz
  • Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber trans. and ed. G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
    • This is a great collection of many of Leibniz’ most important works.
  • Leroy L. Loemker trans. and ed. Philosophical Papers and Letters 2nd ed. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1969.
    • This is a much broader collection of Leibniz’s work than the Ariew and Garber text.

b. Secondary Texts

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. New York: Oxford University Press, 1994.
    • This is one of the most influential books written on Leibniz in recent years.  Adams’ book includes detailed discussions of Leibniz on modality and identity, the ontological argument, and the place of bodies in Leibniz’s mature metaphysics, among other topics.
  • Carriero, John.  “On the Relationship Between Mode and Substance in Spinoza’s Metaphysics,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, vol. 33, no. 2 (1995), pp. 245-273.
    • In this article Carriero argues that Spinoza’s account of substance is a traditional one according to which substances are ultimate subjects.
  • Cottingham, John.  Descartes.  New York: Blackwell, 1986.
    • This is a good introduction to Descartes thought, and raises the question of a trialist interpretation.
  • Cottingham, John. The Rationalists.  Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1988.
    • This is a clearly written summary and comparison of the philosophies of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz.  Chapter 3 on substance is recommended.
  • Della Rocca, Michael.  “Spinoza’s Substance Monism,” Spinoza: Metaphysical Themes. Ed. Olli Koistinen and John Biro. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
    • In this article Della Rocca considers Spinoza’s official argument that there is only one substance, and defends it from a number of objections—including the claim that Spinoza is not entitled to hold that substance can have more than one attribute.
  • Della Rocca, Michael.  Spinoza. Routledge: 2008.
    • This book is an excellent overview of Spinoza’s life and philosophy; Della Rocca’s discussion of Spinoza’s account of substance in contrast to Descartes’ is especially good.
  • Huenemann, Charles. “Predicative Interpretations of Spinoza’s Divine Extension,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, vol. 14, no. 1 (1997), pp. 53-76.
    • In this article Huenemann offers an account of Spinoza’s extended substance which differs from other influential interpretations in important ways.  In doing so, he takes up the question of the divisibility of substance and Spinoza’s vacuum argument.
  • Hoffman, Paul.  “The Unity of Descartes’s Man,” Philosophical Review, vol. 95, no. 3 (1986), pp. 339-370.
    • In this often cited article, Hoffman makes the case for a trialist reading of Descartes and along the way offers a number of criticisms of monist interpretations of substance.
  • Hoffman, Joshua, and Rosenkrantz, Gary S.  Substance: Its Nature and Existence.  Routledge, 1997.
    • In this book Hoffman and Rosenkrantz draw on the ideas of philosophers from the past (including Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz) as well as from contemporary philosophical advancements to develop and defend an account of substance based on independence.
  • Jolley, Nicholas.  Leibniz. Routledge: 2005.
    • This book is an excellent overview of Leibniz’s life and philosophy.  The book is written for the non-specialist and would be a good place for a person with no previous knowledge to start.
  • Kaufman, Dan. “Descartes on Composites, Incomplete Substances, and Kinds of Unity,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, vol. 90, no. 1 (2008), pp. 39-73.
    • In this excellent article Kaufman argues the Descartes is a dualist and that the trialist interpretation espoused by Hoffman (see above) and others is mistaken.
  • Lin, Martin. “Spinoza’s Arguments for the Existence of God,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, vol. 75, no. 2 (2007), pp. 269-297.
    • In this article Lin takes a new look at Spinoza’s arguments for God’s existence, and attempts to defend Spinoza from the charge that it is incoherent to think that God’s has more than one (much less, all) the attributes.
  • Loeb, Louis E. From Descartes to Hume: Continental Metaphysics and the Development of Modern Philosophy. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1981.
    • This book is one of the standards of the field, and in chapter 2 Loeb offers a comparison of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz on substance.
  • Markie, Peter.  “Descartes’s Concepts of Substance,” Reason, Will and Sensation: Studies in Descartes’s Metaphysics. Ed. John Cottingham. Oxford: Clarenden Press, 1994.
    • In this influential article, Markie claims to find not two, but three accounts of substance in Descartes’ work.
  • Robinson, Thaddeus S.  “Spinoza on the Vacuum and the Simplicity of Corporeal Substance,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, vol. 26, no.1 (2009), pp. 63-81.
    • In this article Robinson offers a novel interpretation of Spinoza’s vacuum argument, and makes the case that Descartes’ account of extended substance, at least by Spinoza’s lights, is incoherent.
  • Rodriguez-Pereyra, Gonzalo.  “Descartes’s Substance Dualism and His Independence Conception of Substance,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, vol. 46, no. 1(2008), pp. 69-90.
    • In this article Rodriguez-Pereyra focuses on clarifying the respects in which Descartes’ substances are independent, and argues that other prominent features of Descartes’ account of substance follow from independence so understood.
  • Rutherford, Donald. Leibniz and the Rational Order of Nature.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995a.
    • Although written for specialists, this influential book is highly readable.  Rutherford offers an account of Leibniz’s metaphysics which gives Leibniz’s theodicy and especially important role.
  • Rutherford, Donald. “Metaphysics: The Late Period.” The Cambridge Companion to Leibniz. Ed. Nicholas Jolley.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995b.
    • This article is an excellent summary and discussion of Leibniz’s metaphysics from 1695’s New System of Nature to 1714’s Monadology, and focuses on Leibniz’s account of matter during this period.
  • Skirry, Justin.  Descartes and the Metaphysics of Human Nature.  New York: Continuum, 2005.
    • This book traces Descartes’ scholastic influences and develops a pluralist and trialist interpretation of Descartes’ account of substance.
  • Sleigh, R.C. Leibniz and Arnauld: A Commentary on Their Correspondence. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1990.
    • This is an extremely influential book which offers a reading of one of the most important of Leibniz’s philosophical exchanges.
  • Slowik, Edward. “Descartes and Individual Corporeal Substance,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, vol. 9 no. 1 (2001) pp. 1-15.
    • Slowik picks up where Hoffman leaves off, developing several arguments against the monist interpretation of Descartes.
  • Woolhouse, R.S. “Spinoza and Descartes and the Existence of Extended Substance,” Central Themes in Early Modern Philosophy. Ed. J.A. Cover and Mark Kulstad. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1990.
    • In this article Woolhouse offers a novel reading of Spinoza’s extended substance, claiming that it refers to an essence as opposed to an actually existing infinite extension.
  • Woolhouse, R.S. The Concept of Substance in Seventeenth Century Metaphysics.  New York: Routledge, 1993.
    • This is a good general work on substance during the 17th century.  In addition, Woolhouse offers novel readings of Descartes and Spinoza (see above) on extended substance.  This work offers an especially good look at the relations between mechanics, causation, and substance during the period.
  • Zaldivar, Eugenio E. “Descartes’s Theory of Substance: Why He Was Not a Trialist,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, vol. 19, no. 3 (2011), pp. 395-418.
    • The title says it all.  Zaldivar argues against Cottingham, Skirry, and others.

Author Information

Tad Robinson
Mullenburg College
U. S. A.

Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description

Our own experiences of pain are better known to us than the bio-chemical structure of our brains. Some philosophers hold that this difference is due to different kinds of knowledge: knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description. I have first-hand or direct knowledge of my own experiences; whereas I have only second-hand or indirect knowledge of my brain’s being in a particular bio-chemical state. These two different kinds of knowledge indicate an essential difference in one’s awareness of certain kinds of truths. There is, however, considerable controversy among philosophers whether this distinction can consistently be applied and whether generally knowledge by acquaintance offers a stronger or better perspective on one’s knowledge than other kinds of knowledge.

Some philosophers distinguish knowledge by acquaintance from knowledge by description roughly along the following lines: knowledge by acquaintance is a unique form of knowledge where the subject has direct, unmediated, and non-inferential access to what is known whereas knowledge by description is a type of knowledge that is indirect, mediated, and inferential. There are some significant philosophical issues in spelling out how exactly to make this distinction and even whether it is possible to maintain that there is a privileged kind of knowledge by acquaintance. Nonetheless, many philosophers have put this distinction to work in issues related to epistemology and philosophy of mind.

Table of Contents

  1. The Distinction: Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description
  2. The Epistemology of Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description
    1. Bertrand Russell
    2. Recent Accounts
    3. Criticisms
    4. Replies
  3. The Philosophy of Mind and Knowledge by Acquaintance
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Distinction: Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description

The concept of acquaintance was introduced to contemporary philosophy by Bertrand Russell in his seminal article “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description” (1910) and in chapter five of The Problems of Philosophy (1912) (although see Russell 1905, pp. 479-480, 492-493 for an earlier passing discussion of it). Russell explains that a person is acquainted with an object when he stands in a “direct cognitive relation to the object, i.e. when [the subject is] directly aware of the object itself” (Russell 1910, p. 108). In another place, he writes “we have acquaintance with anything of which we are directly aware, without the intermediary of any process of inference or any knowledge of truths” (Russell 1912, p. 46). To have knowledge by acquaintance, according to Russell, occurs when the subject has an immediate or unmediated awareness of some propositional truth. Knowledge by description, by contrast, is propositional knowledge that is inferential, mediated, or indirect.

The traditional account of knowledge by acquaintance is susceptible to being misunderstood or conflated with merely being directly acquainted with something (on this point see Russell 1914, p. 151). It is important to notice that there is a difference between being directly acquainted with something and having knowledge by acquaintance that something is the case. For a subject to be directly acquainted with something only requires for the subject to have unmediated access to the object of awareness.  Knowledge by acquaintance that something is the case, however, is more than being directly acquainted with something’s being the case. Knowledge by acquaintance, after all, is a kind of knowledge, which requires the subject to hold a belief under the right conditions. For a subject to be directly acquainted with something does not necessarily require the subject to hold a belief about it. Notice the difference in the following claims:

(1) S is directly acquainted with p


(2) S knows by direct acquaintance that p.

Propositions (1) and (2) do not mean the same thing. The truth-conditions for (1) are different than the truth-conditions for (2). In order for (1) to be true, it needs to be the case that the subject is in fact acquainted with p. For example, when p is the fact that one is experiencing a mild pain, all it takes for (1) to be true is that the subject has some unmediated access or awareness of his pain experience.  However, for (2) to be true, more is required. Some person may be directly acquainted with his mild pain experience but fail to have knowledge that he is having a pain experience, perhaps by failing to attend to this experience in such a way that he forms a propositional belief on the basis of his direct acquaintance with the pain experience. (Consider the possibility of an animal--perhaps a fish or a worm--that has the capacity to be acquainted with its pains, but lacks the capacity to form any propositional attitudes.) Thus, (1) may be a necessary condition for (2), but it would be hasty to conclude that (1) is sufficient for (2) or that (1) and (2) are equivalent. The subject needs to be aware of no propositional content about p to satisfy (1). But in order to satisfy (2), the subject needs to have a belief with propositional content about p, which is properly based on his direct acquaintance with p.

2. The Epistemology of Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description

The epistemological issues involving the distinction, knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description, have focused primarily on whether there is privileged unmediated knowledge by acquaintance. I begin with Russell’s epistemic use of the distinction, and then I will survey some contemporary accounts of knowledge by acquaintance. Finally, to round out this overview of the epistemic applications of this distinction I will highlight a couple of criticisms of classical accounts of knowledge by acquaintance and responses to them.

a. Bertrand Russell

Russell used the distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and description to articulate a foundationalist epistemology where knowledge by acquaintance is the most basic kind of knowledge and knowledge by description is inferential (Russell 1910 and 1912, ch. 5). “All our knowledge,” wrote Russell, “rests upon acquaintance for its foundation” (Russell 1912, p. 48). Knowledge by acquaintance, therefore, is a direct kind of knowledge; it is a kind of knowledge that does not depend on inference or mediation. The test Russell employs for determining what someone knows by acquaintance is based on dubitability. For this reason, Russell maintained a person cannot know by acquaintance that physical objects, like an iPod, exist; after all, even when someone is seeing an iPod, it is possible to doubt whether the iPod exists (due to the possibilities of dreaming, illusion, hallucination, and so forth). The sense data, or sensory experiences, of an iPod, however, cannot consistently be doubted by a person who is experiencing them. Thus, sense data can be known by acquaintance, whereas physical objects cannot.  Russell also believed that one could be directly acquainted with memory experiences, introspective experiences (awareness of one’s own direct acquaintances and other internal sensations), universals, and (probably) even one’s own self (see Russell 1912, ch. 5; however, for one place where he is less confident of being directly acquainted with the self, see his 1914, p. 81).

On Russell’s view one cannot know by acquaintance that physical objects exist. Consequently, knowledge by description provides the only possibility of knowing physical objects. Knowledge by description, according to Russell, is dependent on direct acquaintance in at least two ways. First, knowledge by description depends on acquaintance for its propositional content. Russell unequivocally stated, “every proposition which we can understand must be composed wholly of constituents with which we are acquainted” (Russell 1912, p. 58). Although one’s knowledge by description may concern objects that outstrip the range of one’s immediate acquaintance, the propositional content is composed of concepts with which the subject is directly acquainted.

There is a similarity between the way one can know something about particular things outside of one’s experience and the way Russell envisioned knowledge by description to allow a person to think about physical objects. Consider the belief that the tallest living man in the world exists. Someone can form this belief, even though he may have no clue who this individual is. Understanding the concepts of being the tallest, being alive, and being a man are sufficient for allowing a person to hold this belief, even though its referent may lie beyond the set of people that one has met first-hand. Likewise, Russell believed that one could form beliefs about physical objects, despite the fact that one cannot ever be directly acquainted with them. When a person holds the belief, for example, that there is a cup of coffee, he is not directly acquainted with the coffee as a physical object, but he is able to think about the physical object through descriptions with which he is directly acquainted. The descriptive content might consist of there being an object that is the cause of his experiences of blackness, bitterness, hotness, and liquidness. On Russell’s account, the subject’s acquaintance with the right concepts allows him to form beliefs about physical objects.

The second way in which knowledge by description depends on acquaintance is that knowledge by description is inferentially dependent on knowledge by acquaintance. In other words, the propositions one knows by description ultimately are inferred from one’s propositional knowledge by acquaintance. Consequently, this gives rise to a foundationalist epistemology in which all of one’s knowledge is either foundational or inferentially based on foundational knowledge. It is well-known that Russell believed one’s knowledge of the world beyond his or her own mind needed to be inferred from more basic knowledge of one’s own mental experiences (see Russell 1912, ch. 2 and Russell 1914). This raises the difficulty for Russell’s position of how to provide a plausible account of this inferential relationship between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description in a way that successfully accommodates the commonsense notion that most people know that physical objects exist.

b. Recent Accounts

Since Russell, much work has been advanced in his name promoting and applying the distinction of knowledge by acquaintance and description to use in epistemology. On the one hand, there have been traditional acquaintance theorists who have more-or-less kept the original Russellian conception of knowledge by acquaintance; namely the view that one is directly acquainted with one’s own states of mind and not the extra-mental world. Brie Gertler helpfully characterizes contemporary accounts of knowledge by acquaintance as involving judgments that are (a) tied directly to their truthmakers, (b) depend only on the subject’s conscious states of mind for their justification, and (c) are more strongly justified than any empirical judgments that are not directly tied to their truthmakers and dependent only on conscious states of mind for their justification (Gertler 2012, p. 99). The traditional position on knowledge by acquaintance has been most influentially promulgated by the works of Richard Fumerton and Laurence BonJour (for other accounts related to the traditional approach see Balog 2012, Chalmers 2003, Fales 1996, Feldman 2004, Gertler 2001, Gertler 2011, Gertler 2012, Hasan forthcoming, and Pitt 2004).

Fumerton has proposed the following three conditions as necessary and sufficient for knowledge by acquaintance: (i) S is directly acquainted with the fact that p; (ii) S is directly acquainted with the thought that p; and (iii) S is directly acquainted with the correspondence that holds between the fact that p and the thought that p (Fumerton 1995, pp. 73-79). These three acquaintances parallel the requirements for a proposition’s being true (on a correspondence theory of truth): (a) the truth-maker (S is directly acquainted with the fact that p); (b) the truth-bearer (S is directly acquainted with the thought that p); and (c) the correspondence relation (S is directly acquainted with the correspondence between the fact that p and the thought that p). Given the subject’s direct acquaintance with (i), (ii), and (iii), he is directly acquainted with everything necessary to constitute being directly acquainted with a true proposition.

To the extent that BonJour provides an account of knowledge by acquaintance, it is directed exclusively to basic empirical beliefs. BonJour describes his theory of basic empirical justification as taking place when a person directly apprehends that his experience fits or satisfies the description offered by the content of his belief (BonJour 2001; BonJour 2003, especially pp. 60-76, 191-193; BonJour uses the language of “direct acquaintance” in 2001, while he prefers “direct apprehension” in 2003). It is the subject’s ability to have a direct acquaintance or apprehension of the contents of one’s own conscious experiences and how they fit or satisfy the content of one’s basic beliefs that makes knowledge by acquaintance possible. BonJour stresses, however, that fallibility can occur due to the subject’s misapprehension of one’s experience or failure to see the fit between the experience and the belief.  Despite the possibility of error, he believes that this does not undermine genuine cases when a subject does correctly apprehend the character of experience and sees its fit with one’s basic belief.

On the other hand, there are non-traditional acquaintance theorists who have modified knowledge by acquaintance in such a way that one can be acquainted with and know physical objects directly (such as Brewer 2011). Another deviation from the Russellian tradition is to maintain that knowledge by acquaintance is a different kind of knowledge than propositional knowledge (Tye 2009, pp. 95-102). On this non-propositional approach to knowledge by acquaintance, there is a sense in which one can be said to know something with which one is acquainted, even though the person does not necessarily have any propositional belief states about the thing that is said to be known by acquaintance.

c. Criticisms

Perhaps the most influential problem raised for knowledge by acquaintance is commonly called the problem of the speckled hen (due to Gilbert Ryle as reported by Chisholm 1942). The problem arises by considering the case where someone looks at a hen with exactly 48 speckles on one side. Yet, the perceiver’s experience is not adequate grounds for him to distinguish an experience of a hen with exactly 47 or 49 speckles. Indeed, even if someone were to hold the belief that one’s experience is of a hen with exactly 48 speckles, it would by most standards fail to count as knowledge because the subject could have easily formed a false belief (for example, that the hen has 47 or 49 speckles) on the basis of being acquainted with that very experience (for one way to understand this epistemic principle see “The Safety Condition for Knowledge”). In other words, typically people cannot distinguish between having a visual experience of a 47, 48, or 49 speckled hen. However, if a person is directly acquainted with these experiences and can plausibly satisfy the other conditions required for knowledge by acquaintance, then cases of this sort stand as potential counterexamples to possessing knowledge or justification through direct acquaintance. Given the indiscernibility of the contents of mental states through direct acquaintance, this raises doubts whether one’s justification based on direct acquaintance can offer some unique, privileged state of knowledge. After all, one motivation for accepting knowledge by acquaintance is that the subject’s knowledge of his own mental states may be indubitable, whereas other kinds of knowledge cannot. The problem of the speckled hen challenges the idea that one may fail to have indubitable justification through knowledge by acquaintance because for just about any putative mental state with which one is acquainted, since there may be a different mental state that is virtually indistinguishable from it. It even raises the question whether these closely related states constitute genuinely different experiences for the subject at all.

The problem of the speckled hen has continued to challenge contemporary accounts of knowledge by acquaintance (see Sosa 2003a, 2003b; Markie 2009; Poston 2010). The challenge, as Sosa puts it, is for the acquaintance theorist to “tell us which sorts of features of our states of consciousness are epistemically effective ones, the ones such that by corresponding to them specifically that our basic beliefs acquire epistemically foundational status” (Sosa 2003, pp. 277-278, similar remarks can be found in Sosa 2003b, p.121). Here the concern is that the acquaintance theorist has no principled way of explaining why one’s acquaintance with a simple mental state (for example, an experience of three black dots against a white background) is able to ground a justified belief, whereas one’s acquaintance with a complex mental state (for example, a hen with 48 speckles) fails to serve as appropriate grounds for a justified belief. The problem is for acquaintance theorists to provide a plausible account of the conditions and limits of knowledge by acquaintance that naturally explains cases like the speckled hen.

A second influential problem for knowledge by acquaintance is due to Wilfrid Sellars. Sellars (1963) famously critiqued the possibility of acquiring non-inferentially justified beliefs through some privileged, direct relation to one’s sensory experience. The problem that Sellars has raised can be put in terms of a dilemma (for a recent defense of this type of dilemma, see Williams 1999). The dilemma focuses on whether the conscious experiential states of mind are propositional or non-propositional. If, on the one hand, mental experiences are non-propositional, then it is mysterious (at best) to explain how a belief can derive any justification from a non-propositional basis. Donald Davidson expresses the core intuition behind this horn of the dilemma: “nothing can count as a reason for holding a belief except another belief” (1986, p. 126). The central claim at the crux of this side of the dilemma is that only propositional entities can stand in logical or justificatory relations to other propositional entities.

On the other side of the dilemma, if one accepts that mental experiences are propositional, then the problem for acquaintance theorists is to explain how one is justified in accepting the propositional content of experiences. Defenders of this objection stress that this horn of the dilemma pushes the problem of generating non-inferential justification back a step. If beliefs derive their justification from the propositional contents of experiences, then experiences too must derive their justification from some other appropriate source of propositional content. Contrary to the kind of foundationalism proposed by the acquaintance theorist, this horn of the dilemma essentially states that mental experiences do not constitute a non-arbitrary way to stop the regress of justification needed to arrive at a foundational bedrock for empirical knowledge or justification.

Thus, the Sellarsian dilemma appears to leave no viable alternative for the defender of direct acquaintance: (i) if experiences are non-propositional, then they cannot stand in justificatory relations to propositional beliefs; (ii) if experiences are propositional, then there must be some further basis for one to be justified in holding the propositional content of the experiences. The first option alleges that deriving justification from non-propositional content is mysterious and inexplicable. The second option alleges that granting propositional content to experiences does not stop the regress of reasons. Either way, the foundational and unique role that is supposed to be filled by knowledge by acquaintance is undermined.

d. Replies

In response to the problem of the speckled hen, Fumerton (2005) has suggested a variety of options available to the acquaintance theorist. First, it is possible that knowledge by acquaintance fails in cases like the speckled hen because the subject fails to have an acquaintance with the correspondence that holds between the character of his experience and the thought that the experience has a specific character (compare Poston 2007). Recall that on the traditional account, knowledge by acquaintance requires more than only being acquainted with the truth-maker for one’s belief, it also involves some kind of awareness of the correspondence or fit that holds between one’s thought and the experience that is the basis for one’s thought. A second proposal is based on phenomenal concepts (compare Feldman 2004). A phenomenal concept is a concept that one can immediately recognize (for example, being three-sided) as opposed to a concept that involves a process of thought to recognize (for example, being 27-sided). Restricting knowledge by acquaintance to belief-states involving phenomenal concepts can accommodate the challenge of the speckled hen by plausibly maintaining that the concept of being 48-speckled is not a phenomenal concept and thereby not a candidate for knowledge by acquaintance. Third, one can maintain that there are degrees between determinate and determinable properties with which one is acquainted (compare Fales 1996, pp. 173-180). Properties fall on a continuum between being more general to being more specific or determined. For example, a ripe tomato’s surface can be described generally as colored, more determinately as red, or even more determinately as vermilion. Given this distinction in the determinateness of properties, it is possible that one could be directly acquainted with differing degrees of determinable properties. If experiences can instantiate varying degrees of these determinable properties (and this is a matter of controversy that cannot be addressed here), then in cases like the speckled hen the acquaintance theorist may hold that the subject is not directly acquainted with the experience of a hen with 48 speckles but with the experience having a less determinate property such as the property of being many-speckled. Thus, in cases akin to the speckled hen, the subject may not be acquainted with the property of being 48-speckled, but with a less determinate property like being many-speckled.

Another proposed solution to the problem of the speckled hen follows from distinguishing between the phenomenal and epistemic appearances of an experience (Gertler 2011, pp. 103-106). The phenomenal appearance of an experience is determined by the properties that constitute the experience. The epistemic appearance of an experience is what the experience inclines the subject to believe. For example, if someone takes a white plate and holds it under a green light, the plate phenomenally appears green (that is, the property of being green partly constitutes the experience of the plate) but with sufficient knowledge of the effects of green lighting on white objects, it does not epistemically appear green (that is, the subject is not inclined to think that the plate is green). In cases like the speckled hen, then, the experience may phenomenally appear to be 48-speckled, but it may only epistemically appear to be many-speckled. The key to this solution is disambiguating the meaning of “appearance” to explain how in one sense the subject may have an appearance of a hen with 48 speckles (phenomenally) and in another sense the subject may not have an appearance of a hen with 48 speckles (epistemically).

With respect to the Sellarsian dilemma, one response takes the horn of the dilemma that states propositional beliefs derive their justification from non-propositional experiences. For instance, Fumerton (1995, pp. 74-76) proposes an account of knowledge by acquaintance (see above section 2b) where the subject is in a position to know a truth through three acquaintances. Since acquaintance by itself is not an epistemic concept in need of justification, it enables the subject to be appropriately related to the source of one’s justification without necessitating further levels of justification. Thus, in response to the challenge to explain how non-propositional experiences (such as the raw experience of searing pain) can justify propositional thoughts (such as the belief that I am experiencing pain), Fumerton maintains that justification is made possible by being directly acquainted with the relation of correspondence that holds between the non-propositional experience and the propositional thought.

BonJour offers another influential response to Sellars’s dilemma (2001, pp. 28-34; 2003, especially pp. 69-74). On BonJour’s account of basic empirical knowledge (see above section 2b), the awareness or apprehension of the justification for one’s belief is built-in or partly constitutive of the justifying non-conceptual experience. While non-conceptual experiences do not stand in certain kinds of logical relations (for example, inferring) to conceptual beliefs, there is a relation of description or fit that holds between experiences and beliefs. Since certain kinds of experiences have a built-in awareness of their contents, these experiences contain within themselves a kind of reason for thinking that the given description accurately fits. The crucial move in BonJour’s solution is to see that the built-in awareness renders the basic empirical belief justified without any further need for justification.

Staunch defenders of the Sellarsian dilemma will likely remain unimpressed with these responses. The problem, they might urge, is that these alleged solutions push the problem back a level. Those defending the dilemma will press these proposals to explain how propositional beliefs can correspond or accurately describe non-propositional experiences. In some places, Fumerton and BonJour seem to suggest that first-hand experience with our own conscious states of mind adequately demonstrate how these relations are able to hold (Fumerton 1995, p. 77; BonJour 2003, pp. 69-74).

Other friends of direct acquaintance have suggested that experiences, while being non-propositional, may have a propositional structure (or proto-propositional structure) that allows for propositional content to map onto it (Fales 1996, pp. 166-169). For example, a non-propositional experience may be constituted by presenting particulars exemplifying specific properties, which naturally provides a structure resembling statements in the subject-predicate form. Timothy McGrew contends that basic empirical beliefs can be formed by indexically referring to one’s non-propositional experience as part of what constitutes the propositional content of the belief (1995, especially pp. 89-90). By embedding the non-propositional content as a constituent part of the belief (for example, “I am being appeared to thusly”), it is possible to show how non-propositional experiences may provide a basis for forming justified propositional beliefs (for some concerns about the richness of indexically formed beliefs to serve as a foundation see Sosa 2003b, especially pp. 122-124).

3. The Philosophy of Mind and Knowledge by Acquaintance

While knowledge by acquaintance has its most immediate application to philosophical topics in epistemology, it has increasingly been applied to issues in metaphysics, especially in the philosophy of mind. In particular, knowledge by acquaintance has played a role in the knowledge argument against physicalism. Some argue that knowledge of qualia is direct and unmediated, which provides an insight into the nature of the mind that cannot be known through the physical sciences. Frank Jackson presents this argument through a compelling thought experiment about Mary (Jackson 1982; 1986). Mary is a scientist who learns all the physical truths from her exhaustive study of the completed physics. For whatever reasons, Mary has lived her entire life without experiencing any colors besides black, white, and shades of gray. One day after she has mastered all the physical truths and everything that can be deduced a priori from them, Mary leaves her black-and-white environment and sees a ripe tomato.  Intuitively, it seems that Mary learns something new with this experience; she learns this is what it’s like to have a red experience. Since Mary knew all the physical truths prior to seeing the ripe tomato and since Mary learned something new about the world after seeing the ripe tomato, the implication of the thought experiment, then, is that physicalism is false.

More recently David Chalmers has made use of knowledge by acquaintance to support property dualism in the same vein as the knowledge argument. His arguments rely in part on the notion that our direct knowledge of phenomenal conscious states justifies our beliefs about them (see Chalmers 1996, especially pp. 196-198; 2004; 2007). Among his arguments is the case from the asymmetry between one’s knowledge of consciousness and the rest of the world (Chalmers 1996, pp. 101-103). A person’s knowledge of consciousness is based on first-hand, direct experiences of it, not evidence that is external to one’s immediate access. His argument, roughly stated, is that since subjects know by acquaintance that phenomenal consciousness exists and possesses certain features, and this knowledge cannot be deduced a priori from one’s knowledge of physical truths, it follows that these features of conscious experience are not physical.

Some philosophers have attempted to defend physicalist theories of mind with the notion of knowledge by acquaintance, albeit by employing a non-traditional approach to knowledge by acquaintance (compared to the traditional approach as described in section 1 and section 2). Generally these approaches have endorsed that knowledge by acquaintance is nothing more than a subject’s being directly acquainted with a property or fact, and they have deviated from the traditional position that knowledge by acquaintance requires propositional belief (see Conee 1994 and Tye 2009). Those who use knowledge by acquaintance to defend physicalism claim that the knowledge argument only highlights two different ways of knowing the same thing. One way this case has been made is by suggesting that one can know all the propositional truths about something (for example, the city of Houston) and yet not know it directly. The difference between knowledge of phenomenal consciousness and knowledge of brain states is like the difference between knowing about Houston (by reading a very thorough visitor’s guide) and knowing Houston directly (by visiting the city). According to these views, it is because knowledge by acquaintance is a different kind of knowledge that phenomenal knowledge appears to differ from descriptive, physical knowledge about brain states. Although there is not space for a full evaluation of these views, one problem that has been raised is that knowledge by acquaintance cannot by itself account for the epistemic disparity that this solution is attempting to solve (see Nida-Rümelin 1995; Gertler 1999). In other words, the problem is that there appears to be propositional, factual content about the properties of conscious experience that these non-standard accounts of knowledge by acquaintance fail to capture.

4. Conclusion

The distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description has a number of important applications in philosophy. In epistemology, it underwrites a tradition from Bertrand Russell that continues to influence debates on the nature of foundationalism and the possibility of a privileged class of knowledge. In metaphysics, knowledge by acquaintance has increasingly been incorporated into arguments concerning the nature of conscious experience and the viability of physicalism. The current trend suggests that knowledge by acquaintance will continue to be refined and put to work on a variety of philosophical fronts.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Balog, K. 2012. “Acquaintance and the Mind-Body Problem.” In Simone Gozzano and Christopher Hill (eds.), New Perspectives on Type Identity: The Mental and the Physical (pp. 16-43). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • BonJour, L. 2001. “Toward a Defense of Empirical Foundationalism.” In Michael Raymond DePaul (ed.), Resurrecting Old-Fashioned Foundationalism (pp. 21-38). Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • BonJour, L. 2003. “A Version of Internalist Foundationalism.” In Laurence BonJour and Ernest Sosa (eds.), Epistemic Justification: Internalism Vs. Externalism, Foundations Vs. Virtues (pp.5-96). Malden: Blackwell.
  • Brewer, B. 2011. Perception and its Objects. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chalmers, D. 1996. The Conscious Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chalmers, D. 2003. “The Content and Epistemology of Phenomenal Belief.” In Quentin Smith and Aleksandar Jokic (eds.), Consciousness: New Philosophical Perspectives (pp. 220-272). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chalmers, D. 2004. “Phenomenal Concepts and the Knowledge Argument.” In Peter Ludlow, Yujin Nagasawa, and Daniel Stoljar (eds.), There’s Something about Mary: Essays on Phenomenal Consciousness and Frank Jackson’s Knowledge Argument (pp. 269-298). Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Chalmers, D. 2007. “Phenomenal Concepts and the Explanatory Gap.” In Torin Alter and Sven Walter (eds.), Phenomenal Concepts and Phenomenal Knowledge: New Essays on Consciousness and Physicalism (pp. 167-194). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chisholm, R. 1942. “The Problem of the Speckled Hen.” Mind 51, 368-373.
  • Conee, E. 1994. “Phenomenal Knowledge.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 72, 136-150.
  • Davidson, D. 1986. “A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge.” In Ernest Lepore (ed.), Truth and Interpretation: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson (pp. 423-438). Malden: Blackwell.
  • Fales, E. 1996. A Defense of the Given. Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Feldman, R. 2004. “The Justification of Introspective Beliefs.” In Earl Conee and Richard Feldman (eds.), Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology (pp. 199-218). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fumerton, R. 1995. Metaepistemology and Skepticism. Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Fumerton, R. 2005. “Speckled Hens and Objections of Acquaintance.” Philosophical Perspectives 19, 121-138.
  • Gertler, B. 1999. “A Defense of the Knowledge Argument.” Philosophical Studies 93, 317-336.
  • Gertler, B. 2001. “Introspecting Phenomenal States.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 63, 305–328.
  • Gertler, B. 2011. Self-Knowledge. New York: Routledge.
  • Gertler, B. 2012. “Renewed Acquaintance.” In Declan Smithies and Daniel Stoljar (eds.), Introspection and Consciousness (pp. 93-128). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hasan, A. Forthcoming. “Phenomenal Conservatism, Classical Foundationalism, and Internalist Justification.” Philosophical Studies.
  • Jackson, F. 1982. “Epiphenomenal Qualia.” Philosophical Quarterly 32, 126-136.
  • Jackson, F. 1986. “What Mary Didn’t Know.” The Journal of Philosophy 83, 291-295.
  • Markie, P. 2009. “Classical Foundationalism and Speckled Hens.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 79, 190-206.
  • McGrew, T. 1995. The Foundations of Knowledge. Lanham: Littlefield Adams.
  • Nida-Rümelin, M. 1995. “What Mary Couldn’t Know: Belief about Phenomenal States.” In Thomas Metzinger (ed.), Conscious Experience (pp. 219-241). Exeter: Imprint Academic.
  • Pitt, D. “The Phenomenology of Cognition, or, What it is Like to Think That P?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 69, 1-36.
  • Poston, T. 2007. “Acquaintance and the Problem of the Speckled Hen.” Philosophical Studies 132, 331-346.
  • Poston, T. 2010. “Similarity and Acquaintance.” Philosophical Studies 147, 369-378.
  • Russell, B. 1905. “On Denoting.” Mind 14, 479-493.
  • Russell, B. 1910. “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 11, 108-128.
  • Russell, B. 1997 [1912]. Problems of Philosophy, ed. John Perry. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Russell, B. 1993 [1914]. Our Knowledge of the External World. New York: Routledge.
  • Sellars, W. 1963. Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind. In Science, Perception, and Reality. London: Routledge and Keagan Paul.
  • Sosa, E. 2003a. “Privileged Access.” In Quentin Smith and Aleksandar Jokic (eds.), Consciousness: New Philosophical Perspectives (pp. 273-292). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sosa, E. 2003b. “Beyond Internal Foundations to External Virtues.” In Laurence BonJour and Ernest Sosa (eds.), Epistemic Justification: Internalism Vs. Exeternalism, Foundations Vs. Virtues (pp. 99-170). Malden: Blackwell.
  • Tye, M. 2009. Consciousness Revisited. Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Williams, M. 1999 [1977]. Groundless Belief. Princeton: Princeton University Press.


Author Information

John M. DePoe
Marywood University
U. S. A.