By its broadest definition, the term ‘Neo-Kantianism’ names any thinker after Kant who both engages substantively with the basic ramifications of his transcendental idealism and casts their own project at least roughly within his terminological framework. In this sense, thinkers as diverse as Schopenhauer, Mach, Husserl, Foucault, Strawson, Kuhn, Sellers, Nancy, Korsgaard, and Friedman could loosely be considered Neo-Kantian. More specifically, ‘Neo-Kantianism’ refers to two multifaceted and internally-differentiated trends of thinking in the late Nineteenth and early Twentieth-Centuries: the Marburg School and what is usually called either the Baden School or the Southwest School. The most prominent representatives of the former movement are Hermann Cohen, Paul Natorp, and Ernst Cassirer. Among the latter movement are Wilhelm Windelband and Heinrich Rickert. Several other noteworthy thinkers are associated with the movement as well.

Neo-Kantianism was the dominant philosophical movement in German universities from the 1870's until the First World War. Its popularity declined rapidly thereafter even though its influences can be found on both sides of the Continental/Analytic divide throughout the twentieth century. Sometimes unfairly cast as narrowly epistemological, Neo-Kantianism covered a broad range of themes, from logic to the philosophy of history, ethics, aesthetics, psychology, religion, and culture. Since then there has been a relatively small but philosophically serious effort to reinvigorate further historical study and programmatic advancement of this often neglected philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Proto Neo-Kantians
  2. Marburg
  3. Baden
  4. Associated Members
  5. Legacy
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Principle Works by Neo-Kantians and Associated Members
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Proto Neo-Kantians

During the first half of the Nineteenth-Century, Kant had become something of a relic. This is not to say that major thinkers were not strongly influenced by Kantian philosophy. Indeed there are clear traces in the literature of the Weimar Classicists, in the historiography of Bartold Georg Niebuhr (1776-1831) and Leopold von Ranke (1795-1886), in Wilhelm von Humboldt's philosophy of language (1767-1835), and in Johannes Peter Müller's (1801-1858) physiology. Figures like Schleiermacher (1768-1834), Immanuel Hermann Fichte (1796-1879), Friedrich Eduard Beneke (1798-1854), Christian Hermann Weiße (1801-1866), the Fries-influenced Jürgen Bona Meyer (1829-1897), the Frenchman Charles Renouvier (1815-1903), the evangelical theologian Albrecht Ritschl (1822-1889), and the great historian of philosophy Friedrich Ueberweg (1826-1871), made calls to heed Kant’s warning about transgressing the bounds of possible experience. However, there was neither a systematic nor programmatic school of Kantian thought in Germany for more than sixty years after Kant's death in 1804.

The first published use of the term 'Neo-Kantianer' appeared in 1862, in a polemical review of Eduard Zeller by the Hegelian Karl Ludwig Michelet. But it was Otto Liebmann’s (1840-1912) Kant und die Epigonen (1865) that most indelibly heralds the rise of a new movement. Here Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814), Hegel (1770-1831), and Schelling (1775-1854), whose idealist followers held sway in German philosophy departments during the early decades of the 19th Century, are chided for taking over only Kant’s system-building, and for doing so only in a superficial way. They sought to create the world from scratch, as it were, by finding new, more-fundamental first principles upon which to create a stronghold of interlocking propositions, one following necessarily from its predecessor. Insofar as those principles were generated from reflection rather than experience, however, the ‘descendants’ would effectively embrace Kant’s idealism at the expense of his empirical realism. The steep decline of Hegelianism a generation later opened a vacuum which was to be filled by the counter-movement of scientific materialism, represented by figures like Karl Vogt (1817-1895), Heinrich Czolbe (1819-1873), and Ludwig Büchner (1824-1899). By reducing speculative philosophy to a system of naturalistic observation consistent with their realism, the materialists utilized a commonsense terminology that reopened philosophical inquiry for those uninitiated in idealist dialectics. Despite their successes in the realm of the natural sciences, the materialists were accused of avoiding serious philosophical problems rather than solving them. This was especially true about matters of consciousness and experience, which the materialists were inclined to treat unproblematically as ‘given’. Against the failings of both the idealists and the materialists, Liebmann could only repeatedly call, “Zurück zu Kant!”

The 1860’s were a sort of watershed for Neo-Kantianism, with a row of works emerging which sought to move past the idealism-materialism debate by returning to the fundamentals of the Kantian Transcendental Deduction. Eduard Zeller’s (1814-1908) Ueber Bedeutung und Aufgabe der Erkenntnishteorie (1862) placed a call similar to Liebmann’s to return to Kant, maintaining a transcendental realism in the spirit of a general epistemological critique of speculative philosophy. Kuno Fischer’s (1824-1907) Kants Leben und die Grundlagen seiner Lehre (1860), and the second volume of his Geschichte der neuern Philosophie (1860) manifested the same call, too, in what remain important commentaries on Kant’s philosophy. Fischer was at first not so concerned to advance a new philosophical system as to correctly understand the more intricate nuances of the true master. These works gained popular influence in part because of their major literary improvement upon the commentaries of Karl Leonhard Reinhold (1757-1823), but in part also because of the controversy surrounding Fischer’s interpretation of Kant’s argument that space is a purely subjective facet of experience. Worried that the ideality of space led inexorably to skepticism, Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg (1802-1872) sought to retain the possibility that space was also empirically real, applicable to the things-in-themselves at least in principle. Fischer returned fire by claiming that treating space as a synthetic a posteriori would effectively annul the necessity of Newtonian science, something Fischer emphasized was at the very heart of the Kantian project. Their spirited quarrel, which enveloped a wide circumference of academics over a twenty-year span, climaxed with Trendelenburg’s highly personal Kuno Fischer und sein Kant (1869) and Fischer’s retaliatory Anti-Trendelenburg (1870). Although such personal diatribes attract popular attention, the genuine philosophical foundations of Neo-Kantianism were laid earlier.

Hermann Ludwig Ferdinand von Helmholtz (1821-94) outstripped even the scientific credentials of the materialists, combining his experimental research with a genuine philosophical sophistication and historical sensitivity. His advances in physiology, ophthalmology, audiology, electro- and thermo-dynamics duly earned him an honored place among the great German scientists. His Über die Erhaltung der Kraft (1847) ranks only behind The Origin of Species as the most influential scientific treatise of the Nineteenth-Century, even though its principle claim might have been an unattr­­­­ibuted adoption of the precedent theories by Julius Robert von Mayer (1814-1878) and James Joule (1818-1889). His major philosophical contribution was an attempt to ground Kant’s theoretical division between phenomena and noumena within empirically verifiable sense physiognomy. In place of the materialist’s faith in sense perception as a copy of reality and in advance of Kant’s general ignorance about the neurological conditions of experience, Helmholtz noted that when we see or hear something outside us there is a complicated process of neural stimulation. Experience is neither a direct projection of the perceived object onto our sense organs nor merely a conjunction of concept and sensuous intuition, but an unconscious process of symbolic inferences by which neural stimulations are made intelligible to the human mind.

The physical processes of the brain are a safer starting point, a scientifically-verifiable ground on which to explain the a priori necessity of experience, than Kant’s supra-naturalistic deduction of conceptual architectonics. Yet two key Kantian consequences are only strengthened thereby. First, experience is revealed to be nothing immediate, but a demonstrably discursive process wherein the material affect of the senses is transformed by subjective factors. Second, any inferences that can possibly be drawn about the world outside the subject must reckon with this subjective side, thereby reasserting the privileged position of epistemology above ontology. Helmholtz and the materialists both thought that Newtonian science was the best explanation of the world; but Helmholtz realized that science must take account of what Kant had claimed of it: science is the proscription of what can be demonstrated within the limits of possible experience rather than an articulation about objects in-themselves. Empirical physiognomy would more precisely proscribe those limits than purely conceptual transcendental philosophy.

Friedrich Albert Lange (1828-1875) was, at least in the Nineteenth-Century, more widely recognized as a theorist of pedagogy and advocate of Marxism in the Vereinstag deutscher Arbeitervereine than as a forerunner to Neo-Kantianism. But his influence on the Marburg school, though brief, was incisive. He took his professorship at Marburg in 1872, one year before Cohen completed his Habilitationschrift there. Lange worked with Cohen for only three years before his untimely death in 1875.

Much of Lange’s philosophy was conceived before his time in Marburg. As Privatdozent at Bonn, Lange attended Helmholtz’s lectures on the physiology of the senses, and later came to agree that the best way to move philosophy along was by combining the general Kantian insights with a more firmly founded neuro-physiology. In his masterpiece, Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart (1866), Lange argues that materialism is at once the best explanation of phenomena, yet quite naïve in its presumptive inference from experience to the world outside us. The argument is again taken from the progress of the physiological sciences, with Lange providing a number of experiments that reveal experience to be an aggregate construction of neural processes.

Where he progresses beyond Helmholtz is his recognition that the physiognomic processes themselves must, like every other object of experience, be understood as a product of a subject’s particular constitution. Even while denying the given-ness of sense data, Helmholtz had too often presumed to understand the processes of sensation on the basis of a non-problematic empirical realism. That is, even while Helmholtz viewed knowledge of empirical objects as an aggregate of sense physiognomy, he never sufficiently reflected on the conditions for the experience of that very sense physiognomy. So even while visual experience is regarded as derivative from the physiognomy of the eyes, optic nerves, and brain, how each of these function is considered unproblematically given to empirical experience. For Lange, we cannot so confidently infer that our experience of physiognomic processes corresponds to what is really the case outside our experience of them—that the eyes or ears actually do work as we observe them to—since the argument by which that conclusion is reached is itself physiological. Neither the senses, nor the brain, nor the empirically observable neural processes between them permit the inference that any of these is the causal grounds of our experience of them.

With such skepticism, Lange would naturally dispense, too, with attempts to ground ethical norms in either theological or rationalistic frameworks. Our normative prescriptions, however seemingly unshakeable by pure practical reason, are themselves operations of a brain, which develop contingently over great spans of evolutionary history. That brain itself is only another experienced representation, nothing which can be considered an immutable and necessary basis of which universal norms could be considered derivative. Lange thought this opened a space for creative narratives and even myths, able to inspire rather than regulate the ethical side of human behavior. Through their mutual philology teacher at Bonn, Friedrich Ritschl, Lange was also a decisive influence on the epistemology and moral-psychology of Friedrich Nietzsche.

The progenitors of Neo-Kantianism, represented principally by Liebmann, Fischer, Trendelenburg, Helmholtz, and Lange, evince a preference for Kant’s theoretical rather than ethical or aesthetical writings. While this tendency would be displaced by both the Marburg school’s social concerns and the Baden school’s concentration on the logic of values, the proto-Neo-Kantians had definite repercussions for later figures like Hans Vaihinger (1852-1933), the so-called empirio-positivists like Richard Avenarius and Ernst Mach, and the founder of the Vienna Circle, Moritz Schlick (1882-1936).

2. Marburg

Herman Cohen (1842-1918) was Lange’s friend and successor, and is usually considered the proper founder of Neo-Kantianism at Marburg. The son of a rabbi in Coswig, he was given a diverse schooling by the historian of Judaism Zacharias Frankel (1801-1875) and the philologist Jacob Bernays (1824-1881). Moving to Berlin, he studied philosophy under Trendelenburg, philology under August Boeckh (1785-1867), culture and linguistics with Heymann Steinthal (1823-1899), and physiology with Emil Du Bois-Reymond (1818-1896). One of his earliest papers, “Zur Controverse zwischen Trendelenburg und Kuno Fischer” (1871), was a sort of coming-out in academic society. Against Fischer, the attempt above all to understand the letter of Kant perfectly –even the problems that persisted in his work—was tantamount to historicizing what ought to be a living engagement with serious philosophical problems. Although roughly on the side of his teacher Trendelenburg, Cohen stood mostly on his own ground in denying that objectivity required any appeal to extra-mental objects. Granted a professorship at the University of Marburg in 1876, Cohen came to combine Kant-interpretation with Lange’s instinct to develop Kant’s thinking in light of contemporary developments: a “Verbindung der systematischen und historischen Aufgabe.” It was Cohen who published Lange’s Logische Studien (1877) posthumously and produced several new editions of his Geschichte des Materialismus. More interested in logic than science, however, Cohen took Lange’s initiatives in a decidedly epistemological direction.

Cohen’s early work consists mainly in critical engagements with Kant: Kants Theorie der Erfahrung (1871), Kants Begründung der Ethik (1877), and Kants Begründung der Aesthetik (1889). Where he progresses beyond Kant is most plainly in his attempt to overcome the Kantian dualism between intuition and discursive thinking. Cohen argues that formal a priori laws of the mind not only affect how we think about external objects, but actually constitute those objects for us. “Thinking produces that which is held to be” (Logik der reinen Erkenntnis [Berlin 1902], 67). That is, the laws of the mind not only provide the form but the content of experience, leaving Cohen with a more idealistic picture of experience than Kant’s empirical realism would have warranted. These laws lie beyond, as it were, both Kant’s conceptual categories as well as Helmholtz’s and Lange’s physiognomic processes, the latter of which Cohen considered unwarrantedly naturalistic. The transcendental conditions of experience lay in the most fundamental rules of mathematical thinking, such that metaphysics, properly understood, is the study of the laws that make possible mathematical, and by derivation, scientific thinking. While Cohen did not deny the importance of the categories of the understanding or of the necessity of sensuous processes within experience, his own advancement beyond these entailed that an object was experienced and only could be experienced in terms of the formal rules of mathematics. The nature of philosophical investigation becomes, in Cohen’s hands, neither a physiognomic investigation of the brain or senses as persistent ‘things’ nor a transcendental deduction of the concepts of the understanding and the necessary faculties of the mind, but an exposition of the a priori rules that alone make possible any and every judgment. The world itself is the measure of all possible experience.

The view had a radical implication for the notion of a Kantian self. Kant never much doubted that something persistent was the fundament on which judgment was constructed. He denied that this thing was understandable in the way either materialism or commonsense presumed, of course, but posited a transcendental unity of apperception as, at least, the logically-necessary ground for experience. Cohen replaces the ‘unity’ of a posited self, and indeed any ‘faculties’ of the mind, with a variety of ‘rules’, ‘methods’, and ‘procedures’. What we are is not a ‘thing’, but a series of logical acts. The importance of his view can be illustrated in terms of Cohen’s theoretical mathematics, especially his notions of continuity and the infinitesimally small. Neither of these is an object, obviously, in the views of materialists or empiricists. And even idealists were at pains to decipher how either could be represented. By treating both as rules for thinking rather than persistent things, Cohen was able to show their respective necessities in terms of what sorts of everyday experiences would be made impossible without them. Continuity becomes an indispensable rule for thinking about any objects in time, while the infinitesimally smallest thing becomes an indispensable rule for thinking about the composition of objects in space. Though a substantial departure from the Kantian ascription of faculties, Cohen never prided himself so much on ascertaining and propagating the conclusions of Kant as on applying Kant’s transcendental method to its sincerest conclusions.

Like his Marburg colleagues, Cohen is sometimes unfairly cast as an aloof logical hair-splitter. Quite the contrary, he was deeply engaged in ethics as well as in the social and cultural debates of his time. His approach to them is also based on a generally Kantian methodology, which he sometimes dubbed a ‘social idealism’. Dismissing the practical and applied aspects of Kant’s ethics as needlessly individualistic psychology, he stressed the importance of Kant’s project of grounding ethical laws in practical reason, therein presenting for the first time a transcendentally necessary ought. This necessity holds for humanity generally, insofar as humanity is considered generally and not in terms of the privileges or disadvantages of particular individuals. Virtues like truthfulness, honor, and justice, which relate to the concept of humanity, thus take priority over sympathy or empathy, which operate on particular individuals and their circumstances. Like both experience and ethical life, civil laws could only be justified insofar as they were necessary, in terms of their intersubjective determinability. Because class-strata effectually inculcate authoritative relationships of power, a democratic –or better— a socialist society that effaced autocratically decreed legal dicta would better fulfill Kant’s exhortation to treat people as ends rather than means, as both legislators and legislated at the same time. However, Cohen thought that then-contemporary socialist ideals put too much stock in the economic aspects of Marx’s theory, and in their place tried to instill a greater concentration on the spiritual and cultural side of human social life. Cohen’s grounding of socialism in a Kantian rather than Marxist framework thus circumvents some of its statist and materialist overtones, as Lange also tried to do in his 1865 Die Arbeiterfrage.

Hermann Cohen also remains important for his contributions to Jewish thought. In proportion to his decreasing patriotism in Germany, he became an increasingly unabashed stalwart of Judaism in his later writing, and indeed is still considered by many to be the greatest Jewish thinker of his century. After his retirement from Marburg in 1912, he taught at the Berlin Lehranstalt für die Wissenschaft des Judentums. His posthumous Die Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums (1919) maintains that the originally Jewish method of religious thinking –its monotheism— reveals it as a “religion of reason,” a systematic and methodological attempt to think through the mysteries of the natural world and to construct a universal system of morality ordered under a single universal divine figure. As such, religion is not simply an ornament to society or a mere expression of feelings, but an entirely intrinsic aspect of human culture. The grand summation of these various strands of his thought was to have been collated into a unified theory of culture, but only reached a planning stage before his death in 1918. Even had he completed it, Cohen’s fierce advocacy of socialism and fiercer defense of Judaism, especially in Germany, would have made an already adverse academic life increasingly difficult.

Cohen’s student Paul Natorp (1854-1924) was a trained philologist, a renowned interpreter of Plato and of Descartes, a composer, a mentor to Pasternak, Barth, and Cassirer, and an influence on the thought of Husserl, Heidegger, and Gadamer. Arriving at Marburg in 1881, much of Natorp’s career was concerned with widening the sphere of influence of Cohen’s interpretation of Kant and with tracing the historical roots of what he understood to be the essence of critical philosophy. For Natorp, too, the necessity of Neo-Kantian philosophizing lie in overcoming the speculations of the idealists and in joining philosophy again with natural science by means of limiting discourse to that which lay within the bounds of possible experience, in overcoming the Kantian dualism of intuition and discursive thinking.

However close their philosophies, Natorp stresses more indelibly the experiential side of thinking than did Cohen’s concentration on the logical features of thought. Natorp saw it as a positive advance on Kant to articulate the formal rules of scientific inquiry not as a set of axioms, but as an exposition of the rules—the methods for thinking scientifically—to the extreme that the importance of the conclusions reached by those rules becomes subsidiary to the rules themselves. Knowledge is an ‘Aufgabe’ or task, guided by logic, to make the undetermined increasingly more determined. Accordingly, the Kantian ‘thing-itself’ ceases to be an object that lies outside possible experience, but a sort of regulative ideal that of itself spurs the understanding to work towards its fulfillment. That endless call to new thinking along specifically ordered lines is just what Natorp means by scientific inquiry—a normative requirement to think further rather than a set of achieved conclusions. Thus, where Kant began with a transcendental logic in order to ground math and the natural sciences, Natorp began with the modes of thinking found already in the experimental processes of good science and the deductions of mathematics as evidence of what conditions are necessarily at play in thinking generally. The necessities of math and science do not rest, as they arguably do for Kant, upon the psychological idiosyncrasies of the rational mind, but are self-sufficient examples of what constitutes objective thinking. Thus philosophy itself, as Natorp conceived it, does not begin with the psychological functions of a rational subject and work towards its products. It begins with a critical observation of those objectively real formations—mathematical and scientific thinking—to ground how the mind itself must have worked in order to produce them.

One of the consequences of Natorp’s concentration on the continual process of methodological thinking was his acknowledgement that a proper exposition of its laws required an historical basis. Science, as the set of formal rules for thinking, begins to inquire by reflecting on why a thing is, not just that it is. Whenever that critical reflection on the methods of scientific thinking occurs, there ensues a sort of historical rebirth that generates a new cyclical age of scientific inquiry. This reflection, Natorp thought, involves rethinking how one considers that object: a genetic rather than static reflection on the changing conditions for the possibility of thinking along the lines of the continuing progress of science.

Plato’s notion of ideal forms marks the clearest occasion of –to borrow Kuhn’s designation for a similar notion—a paradigm shift. Under Natorp’s interpretation, Plato’s forms are construed not as real subsistent entities that lie beyond common human experience, but regulative hypotheses intended to guide thinking along systematic lines. No transcendent things per se, the forms are transcendental principles about the possibility of the human experience of objects. In this sense, Natorp presented Plato as a sort of Marburg Neo-Kantian avant le lettre, a view which garnered little popularity.

Like Cohen, Natorp also had significant cultural interests, and thought that the proper engagement with Kant’s thought had the potential to lead to a comprehensive philosophy of culture. Not as interested as Cohen in the philosophy of religion, it is above all in Natorp’s pedagogical writings that he espouses a social-democratic, anti-dogmatic ideal of education, the goal of which was not an orthodox body of knowledge but an attunement to the lines along which we think so as to reach knowledge. Education ought to be an awareness of the ‘Aufgabe’ of further determining the yet undetermined. Accordingly, the presentation of information in a lecture was thought to be intrinsically stilting, in comparison to the guided process of a quasi-Socratic method of question and answer. An educator of considerable skill, among his students were Karl Vorländer (1860-1928), Nicolai Hartmann (1882-1950), José Ortega y Gasset (1883-1955), and Boris Pasternak (1890-1960).

Ernst Cassirer (1874-1945) is usually considered the last principle figure of the Marburg school of Neo-Kantianism. Entering Marburg to study with Cohen himself in 1896, though he would never teach there, Cassirer adopted both the school’s historicist leanings and its emphasis on transcendental argumentation. Indeed, he stands as one of the last great comprehensive thinkers of the West, equal parts epistemologist, logician, philosopher of science, cultural theorist, and historian of thought. His final work, written after having immigrated to America in the wake of Nazi Germany, wove together Cohen’s defense of Judaism together with his own observations of the fascist employment of mythic symbolism to form a comprehensive critique of the Myth of the State (published posthumously in 1946). His wide interests were not accidental, but a direct consequence of his lifelong attempt to show the logical and creative aspects of human life –the Naturwissenschaften and Geisteswissenschaften— as integrally entwined within the characteristically human mode of mentality: the symbolic form.

Cassirer’s earlier historical works adopt the basic view of history promulgated by Natorp. The development of the history of ideas takes the form of naïve progresses interrupted by a series of fundamental reconsiderations of the epistemological methods that gave rise to those progresses, through Plato, Galileo, Spinoza, Leibniz, and Kant. Like Natorp, too, the progress of the history of ideas is, for Cassirer, the march of the problems and solutions constructed by the naturally progressive structure of the human mind. Despite this seemingly teleological framework, Cassirer’s histories of the Enlightenment, of Modernity, of Goethe, Rousseau, Descartes, and of epistemology are generally reliable, lucidly written expositions that aim to contextualize an author’s own thought rather than squeeze it into any particular historiographical framework. A sort of inverse of Hegel, for Cassirer the history of ideas is not reducible to an a priori necessary structure brought about by the nature of reason, but reliable evidence upon which to examine the progression of what problems arise for minds over time.

Cassirer’s historicism also led him to rethink Cohen’s notion of the subject. As Cohen thought the self was just a logical placeholder, the subject-term of the various rules of thinking, so Cassirer thought the self was a function that united the various symbolic capacities of the human mind. Yet, that set is not static. What the history of mathematics shows is not a timeless set of a priori rules that can in principle be deciphered within a philosophical logic, but a slow yet fluid shift over time. This is possible, Cassirer argued, because mathematical rules are tied neither to any experience of objects nor to any timeless notion of a context-less subject. Ways of thinking shift over time in response to wider environmental factors, and so do the mathematical and logical forms thereby. Einstein’s relativity theory, of which Cassirer was an important promulgator, underscores Cassirer’s insights especially in its assumption of non-Euclidean geometry. Put into the language of Cassirer’s mature thought, the logical model on which Einsteinian mathematics was based is itself an instantiation not of the single correct outlook on the world, but of a powerful new shift in the symbolic form of science. What Einstein accomplished was not just another theory in a world full of theories, but the remarkably concise formula for a modified way of thinking about the physical world.

The complete expression of Cassirer’s own philosophy is his three-volume Philosophie der symbolischen Formen (1923-9). In keeping with a general Kantianism, Cassirer argues that the world is not given as such in human experience, but mediated by subject-side factors. Cassirer thought that more complex structures constituted experience and the human necessity to think along certain pre-given lines. What Cassirer adds is a much greater historical sensitivity to earlier forms of human thinking as they were represented in myths and early religious expressions. The more complex and articulate forms of culture –the three major ones are language, myth, and science— are not a priori necessary across time or cultures, but are achieved by a sort of dialectical solution to problems arising when other cultural forms become unsustainable. Knowledge for Cassirer, unlike Natorp, is not so much the process of determination, but a web of psycho-linguistic relations. The human mind progresses over history through linguistic and cultural forms, from the affective expressions of primitives, to representational language, which situates objects in spatial and temporal relations, to the purely logical and mathematical forms of signification. The unique human achievement is the symbolic form, an energy of the intellect that binds a particular sensory signal to a meaningful general content. By means of symbols, humans not only navigate the world empirically and not only understand the world logically, but make the world meaningful to themselves culturally. This symbolic capacity is indeed what separates the human species from the animals. Accordingly, Cassirer saw himself as having synthesized the Neo-Kantian insights about subjectivity with the roughly Hegelian-themed phenomenology of conscious forms.

3. Baden

The intellectual pride of the Marburg school fostered a prickly relationship with their fellow neo-Kantians. The rivalry developed with the Baden Neo-Kantians (alternately named the “Southwest” school) was not so much a competition for the claim to doctrinal orthodoxy as much as what the proper aims and goals of Kant-studies should be. Although it is a generalization, where the Marburg Neo-Kantians sought clarity and methodological precision, the Baden school endeavored to explore wider applications of Kantian thought to contemporary cultural issues. Like their Marburg counterparts, they concerned themselves with offering a third, critical path between speculative idealism and materialism, but turned away from how science or mathematics were grounded in the logic of the mind toward an investigation of the human sciences and the transcendental conditions of values. While they paid greater attention to the spiritual and cultural side of human life than the Marburg school, they were less active in the practical currents of political activity.

Wilhelm Windelband (1848-1915), a student of Kuno Fischer and Hermann Lotze (1817-1881), set the tone of the school by claiming that to truly understand Kant was not a matter of philological interpretation–per Fischer—nor a return to Kant–per Liebmann—but of surpassing Kant along the very path he had blazed. Never an orthodox Kantian, he originally said "Kant verstehen, heißt über ihn hinausgehen." Part of that effort sprung from Kant’s distinction between different kinds of judgment as being appropriate to different forms of inquiry. Whereas the Marburg school’s conception of logic was steeped in Kant, Windleband found certain elements of Fichte, Hegel, and Lotze to be fruitful. Moreover, the Marburgers too-hastily applied theoretical judgment to all fields of intellectual investigation summarily, and thereby conflated the methods of natural science with proper thinking as such. This effectively relegated the so-called cultural sciences, like history, sociology, and the arts – Geisteswissenschaften – to a subsidiary intellectual rank behind logic, mathematics, and the natural science – Naturwissenschaften. Windelband thought, on the contrary, that these two areas of inquiry had a separate but equal status. To show that, Windelband needed to prove the methodological rigor of those Geisteswissenschaften, something which had been a stumbling block since the Enlightenment. In a distinctly Kantian vein, he was able to show that the conditions for the possibility of judging the content of any of the Geisteswissenschaften took the shape of idiographic descriptions, which focus on the particular, unique, and contingent. The natural sciences, on the other hand, are generalizing, law-positing, and nomothetic. Idiographic descriptions are intended to inform, nomothetic explanations to demonstrate. The idiographic deals in Gestaltungen, the nomothetic in Gesetze. Both are equally parts of the human endeavor.

The inclination to seek a more multifaceted conception of subjectivity was a hallmark of the Baden Neo-Kantians. The mind is not a purely mathematical or logical function designed to construct laws and apply them to the world of objects; it works in accordance with the environment in which it operates. What is constructed is done as a response to a need generated by that socio-cultural-historical background. This notion was a sort of leitmotif to Windelband’s own history of philosophy, which for the first time addressed philosophers organically in terms of the philosophical problems they faced and endeavored to solve rather than as either a straightforward chronology, a series of schools, or, certainly, a sort of Hegelian conception of a graduated dialectical unfolding of a single grand idea.

Heinrich Rickert (1863-1936) began his career with a concentration on epistemology. Alongside many Neo-Kantians, he denied the cogency of a thing itself, and thereby reduced an ontology of externalities to a study of the subjective contents of a common, universal mind. Having dissertated under Windelband in 1888 and succeeding him at Heidelberg in 1916, Rickert also came to reject the Marburger's assumption that the methodologies of natural science were the rules for thinking as such. Rickert argued instead that the mind engages the world along the dual lines of Geisteswissenschaften and Naturwissenschaften according to idiographic or nomothetic judgments respectively, the division which Rickert borrowed from his friend Windelband and elaborated upon (although it is sometimes attributed to Rickert or even Dilthey mistakenly). And similar to him as well, Rickert considered it a major project of philosophy to ground the former in a critical method, as a sort of transcendental science of culture. Where Rickert went his own way was in his critique of scientific explanations insofar as they rested on abstracted generalizations and in his privilege of historical descriptions on account of their attention to life’s genuine particularity and the often irrational character of historical change. Where Windelband saw equality-but-difference between the Geistes—and Naturwissenschaften, Rickert saw the latter as deficient insofar as it was incapable of addressing values.

History, for Rickert, was the exemplary case of a human science. Historians write about demonstrable facts in time and space, wherein the truth or falsity of a claim can be demonstrated with roughly the same precision as the natural sciences. The relational links between historical events – causes, influences, consequences – rely on mind-centered concepts rather than on observable features of a world outside the historian; though this of itself would not preclude the possibility of at least phenomenal explanations of history. More importantly, historians deal with events which cannot be isolated, repeated, or tested, particular individuals whose actions cannot be subsumed under generalizations, and with human values which resist positive nomothetic explanation. Those values constitute the essence of an historiographical account in a way entirely foreign to the physical sciences, whose objects of inquiry – atoms, gravitational forces, chemical bonds, etc.—remain value-neutral. A historian passes judgment about the successes and failures of policies, assigns titular appellations from Alexander the Great to Ivan the Terrible, decides who is king and who a tyrant, and regards eras as contributions or hindrances to human progress. The values of historians essentially comprise what story is told about the past, even if this sacrifices history’s status as an exact, demonstrable, or predictive science.

Rickert’s differentiation of the methods of history and science has been influential on post-modern continental theorists, in part through his friend and colleague, Karl Jaspers (1883-1969), and through his doctoral student, Martin Heidegger (1889-1976). The traditional scientific reliance on a correspondential theory of truth seemed woefully uncritical and thereby inadequate to the cultural sciences. The very form of reality should be understood as a product of a subject’s judgment. However, Rickert’s recognition of this subjective side did not entangle him in value relativism. Although the historian’s values, for example, do indeed inform the account, Rickert also thought that values were nothing exclusively personal. Values, in fact, express proximate universals across cultures and eras. Philosophy itself, as a critical inquiry into the values that inform judgment, reveals the endurance and trans-cultural nature of values in such a way that grounds the objectivity of an historical account in the objectivity of the values he or she holds. That truth is something that ‘ought to be sought’ is perhaps one such value. But Rickert has been criticized for believing that the values of historians on issues of personal ethics, the defensibility of wars, the treatment of women, or the social effects of religion were universally agreed upon.

4. Associated Members

Twentieth-century attempts to categorize thinkers historically into this or that school led to some debate about which figures were ‘really’ Neo-Kantian. But this overlooks the fact that even until the mid-1880’s the term ‘Neo-Kantian’ was rarely self-appellated. Unlike other more tightly-knit schools of thought, the nature of the Neo-Kantian movement allowed for a number of loosely-associated members, friends, and students, who were seekers of truth first and proponents of a doctrine second. Although each engaged the basic terminology and transcendental framework of either Kant or the Neo-Kantians, none did so wholesale or uncritically.

Hans Vaihinger (1852-1933) remains arguably the best scholar of Kant after Fischer and Cohen. And he probably maintained the closest ties with Neo-Kantianism without being assimilated into one or the other school. His massive commentary, begun in 1881 and left unfinished due to his health, exposited not only Kant’s work, but also the history of Neo-Kantian interpretation to that point. He founded the Kant-Studien in 1897, which is both the worldwide heart of Kant studies and the model for all author-based periodicals published in philosophy. Vaihinger’s own philosophy, which resonates in contemporary debates about fictionalism and anti-realism, takes as its starting point a curious blend of Kant, Lange, and Nietzsche in his Die Philosophie des Als-Ob (1911). For Vaihinger, the expressions that stem from our subjective makeup render moot the question whether they correspond to the real world. Not only do the concepts of math and logic have a subjective source, as per many of the Neo-Kantians, but the claims of religion, ethics, and even philosophy turn out to be subjectively-generated illusions that are found to be particularly satisfying to certain kinds of life, and thereafter propagated for the sake of more successfully navigating an unconceptualizable reality in-itself. Human psychology is structured to behave ‘as-if’ these concepts and mental projections corresponded to the way things really were, though in reality there is no way to prove whether they do. Freedom, a key notion for Vaihinger, is not merely one side of a misunderstanding between reason and the understanding, but a useful projection without which we could neither act nor live.

Wilhelm Dilthey (1833-1911) remains alongside Vaihinger as one of the great patrons of Kant scholarship for his work on the Academy Edition of Kant’s works, which began in 1900. Taught by both Fischer in Heidelberg and Trendelenburg in Berlin, Dilthey was strongly influenced by the hermeneutics of Schleiermacher as well, and entwines his Neo-Kantian denial of material realism with the hermeneutical impulse to see judgment as socio-culturally informed interpretation. Dilthey shares with the Baden school the distinction between nomothetic and idiographic sciences. Where he stresses the distinction, though, is slightly different. The natural sciences explain by way of causal relationships, whereas history makes understood by correctly associating particulars and wholes. In this way, the practice of history  itself allows us to better understand the Lebenzusammenhang –how all life’s aspects are interconnected—in a way the natural sciences, insofar as they treat the objects of their study as abstract generalizations, cannot. The natural sciences utilize an abstract Verstand; the cultural sciences use a more holistic way of understanding, a Verstehen.

Despite his shared interest in the conditions of experience, Dilthey is usually not considered a Neo-Kantian. Among several key differences, he rejects the Marburg proclivity to construct laws of thinking and experience that supposedly hold for all rational beings. Their consideration of the self as a set of logico-mathematical rules was an illegitimate abstraction from the really-lived, historically-contextualized human experience. In its place he stresses the ways historicity and social contexts shape the experiences and thinking processes of unique individuals. In distinction from the Baden school, Dilthey rejects Rickert’s theses about both the necessarily phenomenal and universal character of historical experience. Since we have unmediated access to our lived inner life through a sort of ‘reflexive awareness’, our explanations of historical events may indeed require a degree of generalization and abstraction; however, our sympathetic awareness of agent’s motivations and intentions remains direct. That inner world is not representational or inferential, but – contrary to the natural sciences – lived from within our inter-contextualized experience of the world. In this way, Dilthey alsocrossed the mainstay Neo-Kantian position on the role of psychology in the human sciences. It is not a field alongside sociology or economics that requires a transcendental grounding in order to gain a nomothetic status. Psychology is an immediate descriptive science that alone enables the other Geisteswissenschaften to be understood properly as a sort of mediation between the individual and their social milieu. Dilthey thought the results of psychology will, contra Windelband, allow us to move beyond a purely idiographic description of individuals to a law-like (though not strictly nomothetic) typology according to worldviews or ‘Weltanschauungen’.

Max Weber (1864-1920) was a student and friend of Rickert’s in Freiburg, and was also concerned with distinguishing the logic of historical judgment from that of the natural sciences. The past itself contains no intelligibility. Intelligibility is something added by means of the historian’s act of contextualizing an individual in his or her social environment. Unlike Comte (1798-1857), whatever ‘laws’ we might discover in history are really just constructions. And unlike Durkheim (1858-1917), talk of ‘societies’ runs the risk of hypostasizing what is actually a convenient symbol. Social history should instead be about trying to understand the motivations behind individual and particular changes.

The sociology of Georg Simmel (1858-1918) was also informed by a personal connection to Rickert. From its foundation by Comte and Mill (1806-1873), sociology had been marked by both a positivist theory of explanation-under-law and by an uncritical empiricism. Simmel, with the familiar Neo-Kantian move, undermined their naivety and replaced it with a more careful consideration of how society could be conceived at all. How do individuals relate to society, in what sense does society have a sort of psychology in its own right that generates changes and out of which spiritual shifts emerge, and how do the representational faculties affect societal rituals like money, fashion, and the construction of cities?

Taking history away from its sociological orientation and back to its conceptual roots was Emil Lask (1875-1915). Having dissertated on Fichte under Rickert in 1902 and habilitated on legal theory under Windelband in 1905, Lask was called to Heidelberg in 1910, where his inaugural lecture –“Hegel in seinem Verhältnis zur Weltanschauung der Aufklärung”— intimated a rather different line of influence. His work is comprised of two major published titles: Logik der Philosophie oder die Kategorienlehre (1911) and Lehre vom Urteil (1912). In them, Lask works out an immediate-intuitional theory of knowledge that went beyond the Kantian categories of the understanding of objects into the realm of a logic of values, and even probed the borders of the irrational. In fact he criticized the generalities of the Baden school’s Problemsgeschichte for lacking a concrete grounding in actual historical movements. Although Lask’s insistence to fight on the eastern front in the First World War cut short what should have been a promising career, he had significant influence on German philosophy through Weber, Lukács, and Heidegger. His death, in the same year as Windelband’s, stands as the usual endpoint of the Baden school of Neo-Kantianism.

The physiognomic leanings of the Neo-Kantian forerunners, like Helmholtz and Lange, were revitalized by a pair of philosophers of considerable scientific reputation. Richard Avenarius (1843-96) and Ernst Mach (1838-1916), founders of empirio-criticism, sought to overcome the idealism-materialism rift in German academic philosophy by closer investigation into the nature of experience. This entailed replacing traditional physics with a phenomenalistic conception of thermodynamics as the model of positivist science. In his Kritik der reinen Erfahrung (1888-90), Avenarius showed that the physiognomic factors of experience vary according to environmental conditions. As the nervous system develops regular patterns within a relatively constant environment, experience itself becomes regularized. That feeling of being accustomed to typical experiences, rather than logical deduction, is what counts as knowledge. Mach was similarly critical of realist assumptions about sensation and experience, positing instead the mind’s inherent ability to economize the welter of experience into abbreviated forms. Although the concepts we use, especially those in the natural sciences, are indispensable for communication and for navigating the world, they cannot demonstrate the substantial objects from which they are believed to be derived.

Alois Riehl (1844-1924) denied Liebmann’s claim that the Kantian thing-in-itself was nothing more than an incidental remnant of enlightenment rationalism. Were it, Riehl argued, Kantianism should give up any pretension to a positive engagement with science. Kant in fact never entirely rejected the possibility of apprehending the thing-in-itself, only the attempt to do so by way of the understanding and reason. It was not inconsistent with Kant to try to articulate noumena mediately, via indirect inferences from their perceptible characteristics in observation. Beyond its spatio-temporal and categorical qualifications, the particular characteristics of an object which we perceive and by which we distinguish it from any other object depend not on us so much, as upon its mode of appearance as it really is outside us.

Although Rudolph Otto (1869-1937) taught in Marburg, he had little interest in the logic of mathematics per se. Otto did, however, follow his school’s inclination to understand the objects of study in terms of the transcendental conditions of their experience as fundamental to the proper study, specifically of religion. What Otto discovered thereby was a new kind of experience –the ‘holy’— that was irreducible either to the categories of the understanding or to feeling. This had a substantial influence on the religious phenomenology of two other loosely-associated Neo-Kantian thinkers, Ernst Troeltsch (1865-1923) and Paul Tillich (1886-1965).

With certain Hegelian overtones, Bruno Bauch (1877-1942) was another fringe member of the Baden school with much to say about religion. While he studied with Fischer in Heidelberg, Rickert in Freiburg, and wrote his Habilitationschrift under Vaihinger in Berlin, he was more concerned than most Badeners with logic and mathematics, and in this respect represents a key link between the Neo-Kantians and both Frege, his confidant, and Carnap, his student. But his views about religion and contemporary politics kept Bauch at considerable distance from mainline Neo-Kantians. Due, in fact to his overt anti-Semitism, he was made to resign his editorship at the Kant-Studien. Having argued that Jews were intrinsically foreign to German culture, his embrace of Nazism during the very period of Cassirer’s emigration was an obvious affront, too, to the legacy of Cohen, whatever honors it may have gained him by the state-run academies.

Nicolai Hartmann (1882-1950) began his career as a Neo-Kantian under Cohen and Natorp, but soon after developed his own form of realism. While remaining largely beholden to transcendental semantics, Hartmann rejected the basic Neo-Kantian position on the priority of epistemology to ontology. The first condition for thinking about objects is itself the existence of those objects. It was an error of idealism to assume the human mind constitutes the knowability of those objects and equally the error of materialism to assume that those objects are all open to knowability. To Hartmann, some objects were able to be known by way of their appropriate categorization. Others, however, must remain mysterious, closed off to human inquiry at least until philosophy could point the way toward new methods of comprehending them. Philosophy’s task, accordingly, was to discover the discontinuities between the ‘subjective categories’ of thought and the ‘objective categories’ of reality, and, where possible, to eventually overcome them.

Given the predominance of Neo-Kantianism in German academies during the turn of the century, a number of fringe-members deserve at least mention here. None can be considered an orthodox 'Marburg' or 'Southwestern' school Neo-Kantian, but each had certain affinities or at least critical engagements with the general movement. Friedrich Paulsen (1846-1908), Johannes Volkelt (1848-1930), Benno Erdmann (1851-1921), Rudolf Stammler (1856-1938), Karl Vorländer (1860-1928), the Harvard psychologist Hugo Münsterberg (1863-1916), Ernst Troeltsch (1865-1923), the plant physiologist Jonas Cohn (1869-1947), Albert Görland (1869-1952), Richard Hönigswald (1875-1947), Artur Buchenau (1879-1946), Eduard Spranger (1882-1963), and the neo-Friesian Leonard Nelson (1882-1927), who, though more critical than not about Neo-Kantian epistemology, shared certain ethical and social Neo-Kantian themes. There was also significant Neo-Kantian influence on French universities in the same years, with representative figures like Charles Renouview (1815-1903), Jules Lachelier (1832-1918), Émile Boutroux (1845-1921), Octave Hamelin (1856-1907), and Léon Brunschvicg (1869-1944). (For a more detailed look at French Neo-Kantians, see Luft and Capeillères 2010, pp. 70-80.)

5. Legacy

From March 17 to April 6, 1929, the city of Davos, Switzerland hosted an International University Course intended to bring together the continent’s best philosophers. The keynote lecturers and subsequent leaders of the famous disputation were the author of the recent Being and Time, Martin Heidegger, and the author of the recent Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, Ernst Cassirer. Heidegger’s contribution was his interpretation of Kant as chiefly concerned with trying to ground metaphysical speculation in what he calls the transcendental imagination through temporally-finite human reason. Cassirer countered by revealing Heidegger’s formulation of that imagination as unwarrantedly accepting of the non-rational. Agreeing that the progress of Kantian philosophy must acknowledge the finitude of human life, as Heidegger held, Cassirer emphasized that beyond this it must retain the spirit of critical inquiry, the openness to natural science, and the clarity of rational argumentation that marked Kant himself as a great philosopher and not only as an intuitive visionary. The Analytic philosopher Rudolf Carnap (1891-1970) was a participant in the Davos congress, and was thereafter prompted to write a highly critical review of Heidegger. What should have been an event that revitalized Neo-Kantianism in contemporary thought became instead the symbol both for the rise of the Analytic school of philosophy and for its cleavage from Continental thought. Increasingly, Cassirer was viewed as defending an unfashionable way of philosophizing, and after he emigrated from Germany in the wake of increasing anti-Jewish sentiment in 1933 the influence of Neo-Kantianism waned.

Even while serious Kant scholarship thrives in the Anglophone world of the early 21st century, Neo-Kantianism remains perhaps the single worst-neglected region of the historical study of ideas. This is unfortunate for Kant studies, since it inculcates an attitude of offhandedness toward nearly a century of superb scholarship on Kant, from Fischer to Cohen to Vaihinger to Cassirer. The Neo-Kantians were also the single most dominant group in German philosophy departments for half a century. Few works of Cohen, Natorp, Rickert, or Windelband have been translated in their entirety, to say nothing of the less prominent figures. Cassirer and Dilthey have attracted the interest of solid scholars, though it tends to be historical and hermeneutical rather than programmatic. Study of Simmel and Weber has been consistently strong, but more for their sociological conclusions than their philosophical starting points. To the rest, it has become customary to attribute a secondary philosophy rank behind the Idealists, Marxists, and Positivists –and even a tertiary one behind the Romantics, Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, and Kierkegaard, none of whom, it may be reminded, held a professorship in the field. It is not uncommon even in lengthy histories of 19th Century philosophy to find their names omitted entirely.

The reasons for this neglect are complex and not entirely clear. The writing of the Marburg school is dense and academically forbidding, true, but that of Windelband, Cassirer, Vaihinger, and Simmel are quite eloquent. The personalities of Cohen and Rickert were eccentric to the point of unattractive, though Natorp and Cassirer were congenial. Their ad hominem criticisms of rival members seem crass, but such gossip is undeniably salacious as well. Some of their writing was intentionally set against the backdrop of obscure political developments, though often with other figures such obscurities give rise to cottage-industries of historical scholarship (see Willey, 1978). The two World Wars no doubt had a severely negative impact on the continuity of any movement or school, though phenomenology has fared far better. The fact that many of the Neo-Kantians were both social-liberals and Jewish virtually guaranteed their works would be repressed in Hitler’s Germany. Forced resignation and even exile was a reality for many Jewish academics; Cassirer even had his habilitation at Straßburg rejected explicitly on the grounds that he was Jewish. He and Brunschvicg both escaped likely persecution by giving up their homeland. But as the examples of Bauch and Fischer make clear, Neo-Kantianism need not be subsumed under a specifically Jewish or even minimally Semitically-tolerant worldview. And as Cohen’s resurgent legacy in Jewish scholarship proves, not all aspects that were once repressed need forever be.

To ignore the Neo-Kantians, however, creates the false impression of a philosophical black hole in the German academies between the decline of Hegelianism and the rise of phenomenology, a space more often devoted to anti-academic philosophers like Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Moreover, the Neo-Kantian influence on 20th century minds from Husserl and Heidegger to Frege and Carnap is pronounced, and should not be brushed aside lightly. In terms of early 21st century philosophy, Neo-Kantianism reminds us of the importance of reflecting on method and of philosophizing in conjunction with the best contemporary research in the natural sciences, something for which Helmholtz, Lange, and Cassirer stand as exemplars. And just as Liebmann’s motto ‘Back to Kant’ was exhorted to bridge the gap between idealism and materialism in the 19th century, so too may it be a sort of third way that rectifies the split between contemporary continental and analytic partisanship. If the old saying still carries water, then “one can philosophize with Kant, or against Kant; but one cannot philosophize without Kant.”

Fortunately there are signs of renewed interest. In 2010, Luft and Rudolf Makkreel edited Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press), which presents a well-rounded contemporary collection of research papers. In Continental Europe, no one has done more to revitalize Neo-Kantian studies than Helmut Holzhey and Fabien Capeillères, who have each published a row of books, editions, and papers on the theme. Under the directorship of Christian Krijnen and Kurt Walter Zeidler, the Desiderata der Neukantianismus-Forschung has hosted a number of congresses and meetings throughout Europe. A 2008 issue of the Philosophical Forum was dedicated to Neo-Kantianism generally, and featured articles by Rolf-Peter Horstmann, Paul Guyer, Michael Friedman, and Frederick Beiser among others. Studies of particular Neo-Kantians have been produced by Poma (1997), Krijnen (2001), Zijderveld (2006), Skildelsky (2008), and Munk (2010). And Charles Bambach (1995), Michael Friedmann (2000), Tom Rockmore (2000), and Peter Eli Gordon (2012) have composed fine works of intellectual history concerning the heritage of Neo-Kantianism in the twentieth century. 

6. References and Further Reading

a. Principle Works by Neo-Kantians and Associated Members

  • Helmholtz
  • Über die Erhaltung der Kraft (Berlin: G. Reimer, 1847).
  • Über das Sehen des Menschen (Leipzig: Leopold Voss, 1855).
  • Lange
  • Die Arbeiterfrage in ihrer Bedeutung für Gegenwart und Zukunft (Duisburg: W. Falk & Volmer, 1865).
  • Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart (Iserlohn: J. Baedeker, 1866).
  • Logische Studien: Ein Beitrag zur Neubegründung der formalen Logik und der Erkenntnisstheorie (Iserlohn: J. Baedeker, 1877).
  • Cohen
  • “Zur Controverse zwischen Trendelenburg und Kuno Fischer,” Zeitschrift für Völkerpsychologie and Sprachewissenschaft 7 (1871): 249–296.
  • Kants Theorie der Erfahrung (Berlin: Dümmler, 1885 [1871]).
  • Die systematische Begriffe in Kants vorkritische Schriften nach ihrem Verhältniss zum kritischen Idealismus (Berlin: Dümmler, 1873).
  • “Friedrich Albert Lange,” Preußische Jahrbücher 37 [4] (1876): 353-381.
  • Kants Begründung der Ethik (Berlin: Dümmler, 1877).
  • Kants Begründung der Aesthetik (Berlin: Dümmler, 1889).
  • Die Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums (Leipzig: Fock, 1919).
  • Natorp
  • Forschungen zur Geschichte des Erkenntnisproblems im Altertum: Protagoras, Demokrit, Epikur und die Skepsis (Berlin: Darmstadt, 1884).
  • Platos Ideenlehre: Eine Einführung in den Idealismus (Leipzig: Dürr, 1903).
  • Philosophische Propädeutik (Marburg: Elwert, 1903).
  • Die logischen Grundlagen der exakten Wissenschaften (Leipzig: Teubner, 1910).
  • “Kant und die Marburger Schule,” Kant-Studien 17 (1912): 193-221.
  • Sozialidealismus: Neue Richtlinien sozialer Erziehung (Berlin: Julius Springer, 1920).
  • Cassirer
  • Zur Einsteinschen Relativitätstheorie: Erkenntnistheoretische Betrachtungen (Berlin: Bruno Cassirer, 1921).
  • Philosophie der symbolischen Formen, 3 vols. (Berlin: Bruno Cassirer, 1923-9).
  • Sprache und Mythos: Ein Beitrag zum Problem der Götternamen (Leipzig: Teubner, 1925).
  • Individuum und Kosmos in der Philosophie der Renaissance (Leipzig: Teubner, 1927).
  • Die Idee der republikanischen Verfassung (Hamburg: Friedrichsen, 1929).
  • An Essay on Man (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1944).
  • The Myth of the State (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1946).

  • Windelband
  • Die Geschichte der neueren Philosophie in ihrem Zusammenhange mit der allgemeinen Cultur und den besonderen Wissenschaften dargestellt, 2 vols. (Leipzig: Breitkopf & Härtel, 1878–80).
  • Praeludien: Aufsaetze und Reden zur Philosophie und ihrer Geschichte (Freiburg im Breisgau: Mohr, 1884).
  • Einleitung in die Philosophie: Grundriß der philosophischen Wissenschaften, edited by Fritz Medicus (Tübingen: Mohr, 1914).
  • Rickert
  • Der Gegenstand der Erkenntnis: ein Beitrag zum Problem der philosophischen Transcendenz (Freiburg im Breisgau: Mohr, 1892).
  • Die Grenzen der naturwissenschaftlichen Begriffsbildung, 2 vols. (Tübingen: Mohr, 1896-1902).
  • Kulturwissenschaft und Naturwissenschaft (Freiburg im Breisgau: Mohr, 1899).
  • Die Heidelberger Tradition und Kants Kritizismus, 2 vols. (Berlin: Junker und Dünnhaupt, 1934).
  • Dilthey
  • Gesammelte Schriften, 26 vols. (Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1914–2006).
  • Vaihinger
  • Hartman, Dühring und Lange: Zur Geschichte der deutschen Philosophie im XIX. Jahrhundert (Iserlohn: J. Baedeker, 1876).
  • Kommentar zu Kants Kritik der reinen Vernunft, 2 vols. (Stuttgart: Spemann & Union Deutsche Verlagsgesellschaft, 1881-92).
  • Die Philosophie des Als Ob (Berlin: Reuther und Reichard, 1911).
  • Weber
  • Gesammelte Aufsätze zur Soziologie und Sozialpolitik (Tübingen: Mohr, 1924).
  • Simmel
  • Über sociale Differenzierung (Leipzig: Duncker & Humblot, 1890).
  • Die Probleme der Geschichtphilosophie (Leipzig: Duncker & Humblot, 1892).
  • Grundfragen der Soziologie (Berlin: Göschen, 1917).

  • Mach
  • Die Analyse der Empfindungen und das Verhältnis des Physischen zum Psychischen (Jena: Gustav Fischer, 1886).
  • Bauch
  • Studien zur Philosophie der exakten Wissenschaften (Heidelberg: C. Winter, 1911).
  • Wahrheit, Wert und Wirklichkeit (Leipzig: F. Meiner, 1923).
  • Lask
  • Gesammelte Schriften, 3 vols., edited by Eugen Herrigel (Tübingen: Mohr, 1923-24).
  • Hartmann
  • Zur Grundlegung der Ontologie (Berlin: Walter De Gruyter, 1935).

b. Secondary Literature

  • Bambach, Charles R., Heidegger, Dilthey and the Crisis of Historicism (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1995).
  • Beiser, Frederick C., The German Historicist Tradition (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011).
  • Ermarth, M., Wilhelm Dilthey: The Critique of Historical Reason (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1978).
  • Friedman, Michael, A Parting of the Ways: Carnap, Cassirer, Heidegger (Chicago: Open Court, 2000). Dynamics of Reason: The 1999 Kant Lectures at Stanford University (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2001).
  • Glatz, Uwe B., Emil Lask (Würzburg: Königshausen und Neumann, 2001).
  • Gordon, Peter E., Continental Divide: Heidegger, Cassirer, Davos (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2012).
  • Hartmann, E. v., Neukantianismus, Schopenhauerianismus und Hegelianismus in ihrer Stellung zu den philosophischen Aufgaben der Gegenwart (Berlin: C. Duncker, 2nd expanded edition 1877).
  • Heidegger, Martin, “Davoser Disputation zwischen Ernst Cassirer und Martin Heidegger,” in his, Kant und das Problem der Metaphysik (Frankfurt a.M.: Vittorio Klosertmann, 4th expanded edition 1973), 246-68.
  • Holzhey, Helmut, Cohen und Natorp, 2 vols. (Basel/Stuttgart: Schwabe & Co., 1986).  Historical Dictionary of Kant and Kantianism (Lanham, MD: Scarecrow Press, 2005).
  • Köhnke, K. C., Entstehung und Aufstieg des Neukantianismus: Die deutsche Universitätsphilosophie zwischen Idealismus und Positivismus (Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 1986).
  • Krijnen, Christian, Nachmetaphysischer Sinn: Eine problemgeschichtliche und systematische Studie zu den Prinzipien der Wertphilosophie Heinrich Rickerts (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 2001).
  • Krijnen, Christian & Heinz, Marion (eds.), Kant im Neukantianismus (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 2007).
  • Külpe, Oswald, The Philosophy of the Present in Germany (New York: Macmillan, 1913).
  • Luft, Sebastian & Capeillères, Fabien, “Neo-Kantianism in Germany and France,” in The History of Continental Philosophy Volume 3: The New Century, edited by Keith Ansell-Pearson & Alan D. Schrift (Durham: Acumen, 2010), 47-85.
  • Makkreel, Rudolph, Dilthey: Philosopher of the Human Studies (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1993).
  • Makkreel, Rudolph & Luft, Sebastian (eds.), Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 2010).
  • Munk, Reinier (ed.), Hermann Cohen’s Criticial Idealism (Dordrecht: Springer, 2010).
  • Ollig, Hans-Ludwig, Der Neukantianismus (Stuttgart: Metzler, 1979). Materialien zur Neukantianismus-Diskussion (Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1987).
  • Poma, Andrea, The Critical Philosophy of Hermann Cohen (Albany: SUNY Press, 1997).
  • Rockmore, Tom (ed.), Heidegger, German Idealism & Neo-Kantianism (Amherst, NY: Humanity Books, 2000).
  • Schnädelbach, Herbert, Philosophy in Germany, 1831–1933 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984).
  • Sieg, Ulrich, Aufstieg und Niedergang des Marburger Neukantianismus: Die Geschichte einer philosophischen Schulgemeinschaft (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1994).
  • Skidelsky, Edward, Ernst Cassirer: The Last Philosopher of Culture (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2008).
  • Willey, Thomas E., Back to Kant: The Revival of Kantianism in German Social and Historical Thought, 1860-1914 (Detroit: Wayne State University Press, 1978).
  • Zijderveld, Anton C., Rickert's Relevance: The Ontological Nature and Epistemological Functions of Values (Leiden: Brill, 2006).


Author Information

Anthony K. Jensen
Providence College
U. S. A.

Antoine Arnauld (1612—1694)

Antoine Arnauld was considered by his peers as one of the preeminent 17th century European intellectuals. Arnauld had been remembered primarily as a correspondent of René Descartes, Gottfried Leibniz and Nicolas Malebranche, and as a dogmatic and uncritical Cartesian who made few if any philosophical contributions. In fact, as much newer research suggests, Arnauld was not a dogmatic and uncritical Cartesian, and he made many philosophical contributions over and above facilitating the development of the philosophical systems of Descartes, Leibniz and Malebranche.

Arnauld’s primary endeavors were largely theological. Indeed, the 18th Century Enlightenment thinker Voltaire wrote of Arnauld that “there was no one with a more philosophical mind, but his philosophy was corrupted” because, among other things, he “plunged 60 years in miserable disputes” (Voltaire 1906, p. 728/Kremer 1990, p. xi). In other words, Voltaire claims that Arnauld wasted his time on religious disputes and theology instead of focusing on philosophy. While it is controversial (to say the least) whether Arnauld’s primary intellectual endeavors were in fact “miserable disputes,” it is certainly true that Arnauld devoted the majority of his efforts and writings to theological and religious questions. Arnauld is likely the figure most associated with a sect of Catholicism prominent in France in the 17th Century called Jansenism (other than Cornelius Jansen for whom Jansenism is so named, see section 1).

However, despite his focus on theological and religious issues, Arnauld was a major figure in the philosophical landscape of the latter half of the 17th century. Arnauld burst onto the philosophical scene in 1641, when he authored the Fourth Objections to Descartes’ Meditations on First Philosophy. After Descartes had finished the manuscript of the Meditations, he sent it to Marin Mersenne to acquire comments from leading intellectuals of the day in Paris, including Thomas Hobbes and Pierre Gassendi. In the eyes of many (Descartes included), Arnauld’s are the best set of objections.

In the 1660’s Arnauld co-authored several philosophical works with others, none more influential and important than the Port-Royal Logic, sometimes called the Art of Thinking. In this work, Arnauld and co-author Pierre Nicole, offer a sophisticated account of reasoning well, which for these thinkers encompassed not just what we might associate with logic proper today, but also issues concerning the nature of ideas, metaphysics, philosophical methodology and ontology. Arnauld corresponded with Gottfried Leibniz in the 1680’s concerning an outline of what would later become one of Leibniz's most influential works, the Discourse on Metaphysics. Arnauld also corresponded with Nicolas Malebranche in a very public controversy. In fact, this controversy has been called “one of the intellectual events of the [17th] century,” which covered, among other things the nature of ideas and the nature of God (Nadler 1996, p. 147). This article focuses on those texts and positions of Arnauld’s that are of the most philosophical interest.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
    1. The Life of Arnauld
    2. Philosophical Works
    3. The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence and the Malebranche-Arnauld Polemic
  2. Arnauld's Cartesianism
  3. The Fourth Objections
  4. The Nature of Arnauld’s Cartesianism
  5. Arnauld's Cartesian Ontology: Dual Dualisms
  6. Philosophical Methodology
  7. Occasionalism
  8. Conception of God and Theodicy
    1. The Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths
    2. Theodicy
    3. Arnauld’s God
  9. Modality
  10. Conclusion
  11. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

a. The Life of Arnauld

Antoine Arnauld, often referred to as “le grand Arnauld” on account of his small physical stature, was first and foremost a theologian (Sedgwick 1998, p. 124). He was born on February 6th, 1612 into a well-regarded family in Paris. After briefly considering following his late father and pursuing a career in law, Arnauld decided, largely at the bequest of his mother and family friend (and friend of Cornelius Jansen) Jean Duvergier, to pursue a life in theology and the Church (Kremer 1990, pp. xiv; Nadler 1989, pp. 15-16). In 1633, Arnauld began his studies at the Sorbonne in Paris and both received his doctorate in theology and became an ordained priest in 1641. Arnauld would go on to ultimately serve on the faculty of the Sorbonne (Nadler 1989, p. 16).

Arnauld’s life was tied to Jansenism and the monastery of Port-Royal. Port-Royal was a convent in France that shifted between two locations (and sometimes both), one just outside of Paris and one in Paris – Port Royal du Champs and Port Royal de Paris respectively. (Sleigh 1990, pp. 26-27). The Port-Royal was associated with Jansenism and was dedicated to intellectual pursuits and notably the education of children (Sleigh 1990, p. 27).

Jansenism is a now defunct sect of Catholicism that sought reform within the Roman Catholic Church. Indeed, many of Jansenism's critics argued that Jansenism was actually a brand of Protestantism and called the movement Jansenism to relate it to Calvinism, so named from John Calvin (Schmaltz 1999, p. 42). Jansenism developed out of the ideas of Cornelius Jansen and his book Augustinus. As the title suggests, Jansen defended an Augustinian inspired system. It is hard to outline many characteristics over and above being inspired by Jansen’s text and their views on grace that are representative of Jansenism or those associated with the Port-Royal (see, for example, Schmaltz 1999). For example, while the Port-Royal had long been associated with Cartesianism, recent research suggests that many associated with the Port-Royal were in fact anti-Cartesian (see, for example, Nadler 1988b). Nevertheless, the central claim of the Jansenist cause that occupies much of Arnauld’s attention at points in his career and plays a fundamental role in several of Arnauld's most interesting philosophical contributions is the Augustinian doctrine of efficacious grace. This doctrine of efficacious grace held that one did not achieve salvation by one’s own merit, but only through the grace of God. Further, if one received God’s grace, one could not fail to achieve salvation. In other words, grace was given (or not given) by God and not earned by one’s own actions (Nadler 1989, p. 16 and Nadler 2008b, pp. 56-57). A second aspect of Jansenist doctrine (or at least Arnauld’s Jansenism) that plays a central role in Arnauld’s philosophical endeavors is a commitment to a “hidden God” (Moreau 2000, p. 106). By a “hidden God”, Arnauld at least, does not mean to claim that God’s works are unknowable or that we can know nothing about God, but rather that in some very substantive ways God is not fully comprehendible by us (see section 5).

Arnauld had a fundamental role in the “Quarrel over the Five Propositions”. In 1653, Pope Innocent X declared the following five propositions heretical. All five of these, the Pope claimed, were endorsed by Jansen in Augustinus:

  1. Some commandments of God are impossible for righteous men, although they wish to fulfill them and strive to fulfill them in accord with the power they presently possess. They lack the grace that would make it possible.
  2. In the state of fallen nature, interior grace is never resisted.
  3. In order to deserve merit or demerit in the state of fallen nature, freedom from necessity is not required in men; rather, freedom from constraint is sufficient.
  4. The Semi-Pelagians admitted the necessity of prevenient and interior grace for each action, even for the beginning of faith; but they were heretics in that they held hat this grace is such that the human will can either resist it or obey it.
  5. It is an error of the Semi-Pelagians to say that Christ dies or that he shed his blood for everyone without exception. [See, for example, Sleigh (1990), p. 27, from whom the translations are taken]

Arnauld refused to submit to Papal authority and accept that Jansen’s text was heretical. While Arnauld granted that the Pope had the authority to decide what was or was not heretical, he denied that the Pope had a similar authority in interpreting Augustinus. In fact, Arnauld argued, Jansen endorses none of these propositions in Augustinus. This incident between the Pope and Jansenists like Arnauld, resulted in much persecution for Arnauld and other Jansenists and those who did not submit to Papal authority. Further, as a result of this incident, Arnauld was removed from the faculty of the Sorbonne in 1656 (Kremer 1990, pp. xv-xvi and Sleigh 1990, pp. 27-28). In 1679, Arnauld went into exile in the Netherlands, during which time he even used a fake name (Monsieur Davy) and never returned to France (Sleigh 1990, p. 26/Jacques 1976, p. 34]. Arnauld died August 8th 1694, in Liège.

[For more information on the life of Arnauld and from which the above account is taken, see especially: Nadler (1989) Chapter II; Kremer (1990); Sleigh (1990) Chapter 3; and Sedgwick (1998), especially Chapter 7. For a general book length-study of 17th Century French Jansenism, see Sedgwick (1977)].

b. Philosophical Works



In the course of his life, Arnauld wrote a substantial amount on both theology and philosophy. Those philosophical writings that are of the most importance are briefly discussed here.

While studying at the Sorbonne, Arnauld authored the aforementioned Fourth Objections to Descartes’ Meditations. In November of 1640, Descartes asked Marin Mersenne (who was the center of the Parisian intellectual world) to circulate copies of the Meditations among other thinkers in Paris to acquire comments and objections so that Descartes could publish them with the first printing of the Meditations. While the group of objectors included Pierre Gassendi, Thomas Hobbes and Marin Mersenne, Descartes claimed of Arnauld’s objections, “I think they are the best of all the sets of objections” (CSMK III 175/AT III 331). Arnauld’s objections to the Mediations have many distinctive features. For example, unlike the objections of Hobbes and Gassendi, Arnauld’s objections to the Meditations are not objections to Descartes’ system, but objections internal to Descartes’ system. Further, Arnauld’s objections resulted in changes in the actual body of the Meditations (see for example, Carraud 1995, pp. 110-111). Some of Arnauld’s objections are discussed below (section 2a). In addition to the Fourth Objections and Fourth Replies, Arnauld and Descartes exchanged two letters each in 1648 wherein Arnauld further presses Descartes on matters related to the Cartesian philosophy (although it is worth noting that Arnauld remained anonymous in these letters). These two letters are often called “The New Objections to Descartes’ Meditations” (and are available in English translation in Kremer’s translation of On True and False Ideas 1990). In these works, Arnauld pushes Descartes for further clarification of central aspects of the Cartesian worldview while simultaneously showing sympathy to that worldview.

Arnauld co-authored works with other Port-Royalists, two of which deserve special mention. The first of these is the Port-Royal Grammar. In this 1660 work Arnauld and co-author Claude Lancelot, construct a general text on grammar, which they define as “the art of speaking” (PRG 41/OA 41 5). They define speaking as “explaining one’s thoughts by signs which men have invented for that purpose” (PRG 41/OA 41 5). In 1662, Arnauld co-wrote a similar work called La Logique, ou L’art de Penser, that is The Logic or the Art of Thinking (henceforth: Logic) with Pierre Nicole. Arnauld and Nicole understand the purpose of logic to “give rules for all actions of the mind, and for simple ideas as well as for judgments and inferences” (B 15/OA 41 27). Thus, Arnauld and Nicole aim to produce a text based on reasoning well and making good judgments. Arnauld and Nicole divide the text into four parts: conceiving, judging, reasoning and ordering. Conceiving is “the simple view we have of things that present themselves to the mind” and is what we do when we represent things to the mind in the form of ideas before making judgments about them. Judging is the act of bringing together different ideas in the mind and affirming or denying one or the other. Reasoning is the “action of the mind in which it forms a judgment from several others.” Ordering (or method) is the mental action of arranging “ideas, judgments and reasonings” in such a way that the arrangement is “best suited for knowing the subject” (B 23/OA 41 125). The Logic is very influential. So influential, in fact, it has been claimed that “The Port-Royal Logic was the most influential logic from Aristotle to the end of the nineteenth century” (Buroker 1996, p. xxiii). Further, while the text is ostensibly one about logic, it also treats extensively metaphysics, philosophy of language, epistemology, theory of ideas and philosophy of religion.

Arnauld wrote a majority of his philosophical work while in exile. In Examen d’un Ecrit qui a pour titre: Traité de l’essence du the corps, et de l’union de l’âme avec le corps, contre la philosophie de M. Descartes, that is, an Examination of a Writing that has for a title: Treatise on the essence of the body, and the union of the soul with the body, against the philosophy of Mr. Descartes (henceforth Examen), Arnauld responds to an attack on Cartesianism by M. Le Moine, Dean of the Chapter of Vitre. The treaty to which Arnauld is responding is now lost (Schmaltz 2002, p. 54; Nadler 1989, p. 26, n 18). In this work, Arnauld defends a Cartesian philosophy, though not an entirely orthodox Cartesianism (see section 4). Arnauld divided the text into four sections: whether Descartes’ philosophy can add anything valuable over and above what scripture tells us; that Descartes’ philosophy is consistent with the Catholic stance on the Eucharist – a Catholic ceremony in which wine and bread are blessed by a priest and the wine and bread, which in the 17th century are taken to either be converted into, or annihilated and replaced by, Christ’s blood and body (see, for example, Nadler 1988, p. 230); that Descartes does not ruin the Church’s belief in the glory of the body; and on the union of the soul and the body. [For a thorough treatment of Arnauld, Descartes and the Eucharist, see Nadler (1988) and Schmaltz (2002), Chapter 1]. The Examen (1680) is especially notable as Arnauld was explicitly defending a Cartesian philosophy, even after Descartes’ works were condemned by the Congregation of the Index in 1663. To have one’s works condemned by the Congregation of the Index was having them being banned by the Catholic Church (see for example, Nadler 1988, p. 239).

c. The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence and the Malebranche-Arnauld Polemic


In addition to the philosophical works described above, Arnauld participated in two events in the 17th century of immense importance, namely the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence and the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic. The most famous part of the correspondence with Leibniz (indeed the part normally referred to as the “Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence”) began in February of 1686 when Leibniz wrote to the Landgrave Ernst von Hessen-Rheinfels. Leibniz sent an outline of what would become one of Leibniz's most important works, the Discourse on Metaphysics, and asked if the Landgrave could give the outline to Arnauld in hopes that Arnauld would comment on it. Arnauld and Leibniz then corresponded with Hessen-Rheinfels as an intermediary. Arnauld’s initial response to Leibniz gives some justification of his reputation as a harsh critic and hot-tempered person. Arnauld claims that Leibniz’s work contains “so many things that frighten me and that almost all men, if I am not mistaken, will find so shocking, that I do not see what use such a work can be, which will clearly be rejected by everybody” (M 9/G II 15). Arnauld adds “Would it not be better if he [Leibniz] abandoned these metaphysical speculations which cannot be of use to him or others, in order to apply himself seriously to the greatest business that he can ever have, the assurance of his salvation by returning to the Church” (M 10/G II 16). In Arnauld’s second letter to Leibniz, he apologizes and offers a more thorough account of what he found so troubling in Leibniz’s philosophy.  It is this letter that begins a philosophical exchange whose rigor rivals the best published philosophical works of the period.

The correspondence had a profound effect on the development of Leibniz’s metaphysical system, so much so that Leibniz considered publishing the correspondence (G I 420, see also Sleigh 1990, p. 1). Further, as we shall see below, Arnauld offers some original contributions in the discussion, most notably concerning modal metaphysics or the nature of possibility. However, it is worth briefly noting two of Arnauld’s objections to Leibniz’s system before we move on. First, Arnauld objects to Leibniz’s account of pre-established harmony. In the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz defends pre-established harmony or as Arnauld refers to it “the hypothesis of the concomitance and harmony between substances” (M 78/G II 64). Leibniz’s view, in brief, is that each substance causes all of its own changes and there is no causation or causal relations between two distinct finite substances. Instead, according to Leibniz, God has set up the universe so that at the exact moment that, for example, Arnauld speaks to Leibniz, Leibniz’s own substance changes itself in such a way that Leibniz hears Arnauld. For example, in the Discourse Leibniz claims:

We could therefore say...that one particular substance never acts upon another particular substance nor is acted upon by it. (AG 47/G IV 358)


God alone (from whom all individuals emanate continually and who sees the universe not only as they see it but also entirely different from all of them) is the cause of the correspondence of their phenomena and makes that which is particular to one of them public to all of them; otherwise, there would be no interconnection. (AG 47/G IV 375)

Arnauld pushes Leibniz to clarify his view (M 78/G II 64) and then argues that Leibniz’s view collapses into a different account of causation prevalent in the 17th century: occasionalism (M 105-106/G II 84-85). The traditional doctrine of occasionalism, most closely associated with the Cartesian Nicolas Malebranche, is the conjunction of the following two claims:

  1. Finite beings have no causal power.
  2. God is the only true causal agent.

According to occasionalism, only God has causal power. When it appears to us that a baseball breaks a window, it is not the case that the baseball (a finite thing) exercises any causal efficacy over the window. Instead, God, on the occasion of the baseball striking the window, causes the window to break. The baseball in this case is often called an “occasional cause”.  However, one should not mistake an occasional cause as something with causal power, rather it simply signifies the occasion for God to exercise His causal power. Returning to Arnauld’s objection to Leibniz, he explains:

It seems to me that this [the concomitance and harmony between substances] is saying the same thing in other words as those who claim that my will is the occasional cause of the movement of my arm and God is the real cause. For they do not claim that God does that in time through a new act of will which he exercises each time I wish to raise my arm; but by that single act of the eternal will (M 105-106/G II 84).

Arnauld’s concern is that if substances are not causally affecting each other, and the correspondence of seeming causal relations occurs only because of God setting it up so that these relations correspond, how could this view be any different than claiming that only God is causally efficacious? We might restate Arnauld’s question as follows: Given that God wills things, not one at a time, but from a single eternal will, how is it any different for God to will from a single act of the eternal will that all ‘interactions’ between different substances correspond with no actual causal relations between them and for God to will the relations between the two substances themselves?

Arnauld may have misunderstood Leibniz in this regard [see, for example, Sleigh (1990), p. 150], as Leibniz would claim that each substance causes its own changes and insist that this is substantively different from occasionalism. However, Arnauld’s objections to Leibniz, at the least, push Leibniz to explain his view, and at best do not suffer from and rely on a misunderstanding of Leibniz’s position and offer a legitimate problem for Leibniz’s view.

Arnauld also criticizes Leibniz’s account substances. According to Leibniz, each created substance has a certain ‘form’ that constitutes its essence (see, for example, Sleigh 1990, p. 116). A full (or even adequate) account of Leibniz on this issue would take us on a long detour. For our purposes we can focus on one particular aspect of what Leibniz says:

If the body is a substance…[and not] an entity united by accident or by aggregation like a heap of stones, it cannot consist of extension, and one must necessarily conceive of something there that one calls a [form], and which corresponds in a way to a soul. (M 66/G II 58)

Take for example a human body. We naturally think of the human body, say Arnauld’s body, as an individual thing with some sort of unity or togetherness. According to Descartes and Arnauld (see section 2c) bodies are essentially extended things and are infinitely divisible. That is, for any body, that body can be divided into an infinite number of parts. Leibniz claims in this passage that if there are extended bodies they cannot be simply things like heaps of stone or simple aggregates. There must be something that unifies the body and this thing Leibniz says corresponds in a way to the soul. The “if” is quite important for Leibniz, for Leibniz seems to be acknowledging the possibility of physical substances being merely “true phenomenon like the rainbow” (see for example M 95/G II 77, Parkinson 1967, pp. xxvi-xxvii and Sleigh 1990, pp. 101-110). Leibniz’s comparison of the potential for physical substances being like a rainbow suggests that such substances might very well be nothing but phenomenon. Nevertheless, Leibniz denies that an extended substance could exist without some “form” providing it a unity.

Arnauld offers numerous arguments against Leibniz’s conception of “forms”. Indeed, as pointed out by Parkinson (1967, p. xxvi), Arnauld makes at least 7 distinct objections to this concept. Several of Arnauld’s objections include: denying that he has any clear notion of what such a “form” is (M 134/G II 107); that he only has knowledge of two types of substances, minds and bodies, and it does not make sense to call these “forms” minds or bodies (M 134-135/G II 107-108); and even that if these “forms” did exist, Leibniz’s account of them is indefensible (M 135/G II 108).

[For a general discussion of Arnauld and Leibniz’s discussion of “forms”, see Sleigh (1990), Chapter 6. For an excellent book-length treatment of the entire Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence see Sleigh (1990), and for a shorter treatment see Parkinson (1967)].

Arnauld also engaged in a decade long public dispute with Malebranche over the nature of ideas and account of God and God’s modus operandi. The debate between Arnauld and Malebranche should be interpreted as a debate between two Cartesians, who have strayed from the letter of Descartes in different ways. The public and private debate between Malebranche and Arnauld consists in many works and letters. The controversy began with Malebranche’s publication of the Treatise on Nature and Grace (henceforth: Treatise). Initially, prior to publication, Malebranche had sent the work to Arnauld for his opinion. However, Malebranche then decided to publish the Treatise without waiting to hear back from Arnauld. This event clearly irked Arnauld and is likely the beginning of the polemic (see Moreau 2000, p. 88 and OA 2 95, OA 2 101 and OA 2 116). In the Treatise, Malebranche offers a theodicy, or an attempt to reconcile the existence of an all-good, all-knowing, all-powerful God with the existence of evil. Prima facie, it seems that an all-powerful, all-good, all-knowing God could create a world with no evil (given all-power), would desire to create such a world (given all-goodness) and would know how to create such a world (given all-knowing). Malebranche offers a highly original theodicy. Malebranche’s theodicy and Arnauld’s objections are discussed in section 5b in regard to Arnauld’s conception of God and theodicy.

Arnauld vigorously responds to Malebranche’s view in print and then the two exchange numerous writings and compose many books arguing against each other for the next ten years (for an overview of the chronology of the debate, see Moreau 2000, pp. 88-92). Three of Arnauld’s works which are of much importance are On True and False Ideas (henceforth: VFI; from the French title: Des vraies et des fausses idées), Réflexions philosophiques et théologiques sur le noveau système de la nature et de la grace, that is, Philosophical and theological relfections on the new system of nature and grace (henceforth: Réflexions) and Dissertation sur la manière dont Dieu a fait les fréquents miracles de l’Ancienne Loi par le ministre des Anges, that is, Dissertation on the manner in which God has made frequent miracles of the Ancient Law by the minister of the Angles (henceforth: Dissertation). [Unfortunately, only the former is currently available in English and even it has only been available in English since 1990, see Kremer (1990), p. xii]. In the latter two, Arnauld goes after Malebranche’s theodicy and conception of God. VFI (1683) was Arnauld’s first contribution to the debate. Curiously, it does not address Malebranche theodicy or the Treatise (the work that started the polemic), but rather Arnauld offers an attack on Nicholas Malebranche’s The Search After Truth, specifically the theory of ideas there presented.

Malebranche offered a very distinct indirect realist theory of ideas. Malebranche’s account of ideas and perception is not always straightforward and not without its own interpretative issues. However, in brief, according to Malebranche, ideas are distinct things independent of the mind and objects that they represent. Further, when a person considers an idea, say of an extended body, the direct and immediate object of my thought is an idea, not the extended body itself. One only has indirect perception of the extended body. Malebranche also holds that these ideas are in an interesting sense “in God.” For Malebranche in human knowledge and perception the human mind perceives an idea and this idea is found in the divine understanding and is God’s idea [See, for example, The Search After Truth book III, part ii, chapters 1-7; PS 27-50 and Nadler (1992), pp. 98-99 from whom this account is indebted. For more elaborate discussions of Malebranche’s account of ideas, see Nadler (1992) and Schmaltz (2000)].

Arnauld vigorously opposed Malebranche’s account of ideas. It is clear that Arnauld argues against Malebranche’s view that there exist objects independent of our perception in God that play a role in our perception. Further, Steven Nadler (1989) has persuasively (although perhaps not definitely) argued that Arnauld was arguing against any indirect realist conception of ideas and instead offered an account in which ideas are modes of the mind and acts of perception such that the direct object of any perception is the thing which is perceived.

While the majority of the attention the Arnauld-Malebranche debate has received has concerned the theory of ideas, the majority of the debate has actually concerned theodicy and God. In the Réflexions and Dissertation, for example, Arnauld argues directly against Malebranche’s conception of God and theodicy, and Malebranche’s account of the order of providence.

This account of the correspondence brings us to an interesting question. While Arnauld’s main target was Malebranche’s theodicy and account of God’s modus operandi, Arnauld begins his attack on a seemingly unrelated issue, namely Malebranche’s theory of ideas. Why would Arnauld begin his attack on Malebranche’s theodicy with an attack on his theory of ideas? Recently, Denis Moreau has offered a very plausible explanation for this fact, an explanation that we will be in a position to consider in section 5b.

Though not addressed below, two other works that are related to the Arnauld-Malebranche debate that warrant mention are the Dissertatio Bipartitia, that is, Dissertation in Two Parts (1692), and Règle du bon sens, that is, the Rules of Good Sense (1693). The former was written by Arnauld in response to a work by Gommaire Huygens, in which Huygens defends a view similar to Malebranche’s concerning the theory of ideas (see TP 36). The latter was written in response to François Lamy, who at the request of Pierre Nicole (Arnauld’s co-author from the Logic), defended Huygens from Arnauld’s attack in the Dissertatio (see TP 37).

With this brief account of Arnauld’s life and works in hand, we can proceed to the heart of the project.

[For excellent treatments of the Arnauld-Malebranche polemic, see: Moreau (2000); and Nadler (1989). Moreau (2000) is an article length summary of the debate while Nadler (1989) is a book length treatment on the debate concerning ideas. In addition, Moreau (1999) is an excellent book-length treatment of the debate, though it is only available in French.]

2. Arnauld's Cartesianism

In the Introduction it was claimed that it is a mistake to view Arnauld simply as an uncritical Cartesian, one who endorses Descartes' positions and offers no critical evaluation, advancement or original contributions. Nevertheless, Arnauld's philosophy was thoroughly Cartesian and his commitment to Cartesian is so fundamental to his philosophy that a section on Arnauld's Cartesianism is in order. We begin with a discussion of the Fourth Objections as this is both one of Arnauld’s earliest philosophical works and involves Arnauld directly responding to Descartes’ Meditations. Then we proceed to discuss the nature of Arnauld’s Cartesianism and finally Arnauld’s commitment to a basic Cartesian ontology.

a. The Fourth Objections


As discussed above, Arnauld was one of the authors of the Objections to Descartes’ Meditations. Arnauld’s objections, the Fourth Objections, include many objections that are of central importance, both philosophically and because they facilitate Descartes further articulating his own positions. Prior to receiving the manuscript of the Meditations from Mersenne, Arnauld was already familiar with and likely sympathetic to Cartesian philosophy. As he tells Mersenne:

You can hardly be after my opinion of the author, since you already know how highly I rate his outstanding intelligence and exceptional learning (CSM II 138/AT VII 197).

Arnauld was familiar with at least Descartes’ Discourse on Method (published in 1637) as he refers to it in the Fourth Objections (AT VII 199/CSM II 139). Returning to the philosophical content of the Fourth Objections, Arnauld offers many interesting and important objections to Descartes' Meditations, all of which cannot be adequately covered here. Some of the most important ones are addressed below.

The first Arnauld’s objection to Descartes concerns the first argument in the Sixth Meditation for the claim that the mind and the body are really distinct (the one that occurs at AT VII 78/CSM II 54). Roughly, for the mind and body to be really distinct is for the mind to be able to exist without the body and for the body to be able to exist without the mind. Descartes begins the argument in question by claiming that:

(1) I know that everything which I clearly and distinctly understand is capable of being created by God so as to correspond exactly with my understanding of it (AT 78; CSM II 54).

And he continues:

(2) Hence the fact that I can clearly and distinctly understand one thing apart from another is enough to make me certain that the two things are distinct, since they are capable of being separated, at least by God (AT 78; CSM II 54).

And he concludes by claiming:

(3) On the one hand I have a clear and distinct idea of myself, in so far as I am simply a thinking, non-extended thing; and on the other hand I have a distinct idea of body, in so far as this is simply an extended, non-thinking thing (AT 78; CSM II 54).

So, he concludes:

(4) And accordingly, it is certain that I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it (AT 78; CSM II 54).

The correct interpretation of Descartes’ argument is controversial. However, fundamental to the argument is the inference from Descartes’ clear and distinct idea of himself (that is, whatever is essential to him) as a thinking, non-extended thing and his clear and distinct idea of body as an extended, non-thinking thing, to the claim that “I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it”. While Descartes does not give us an explicit definition of what a clear and distinct idea is in the Meditations (he does in the Principles of Philosophy, a text that was written later and so one which Arnauld would have not yet seen at the time of the Fourth Objections), Descartes clearly means an idea that has a certain internal feature such that it is very precise in his mind and strikes him with a certain strength. Descartes’ argument moves from our ability to have a clear and distinct idea of ourselves as thinking non-extended things to the “real distinction” of mind and body. Since we clearly and distinctly perceive that mind and body are separable, then minds and bodies are separable. Thus, central to Descartes’ argument is that our ability to clearly and distinctly conceive of mind and body as separate licenses the inference to the claim that minds and bodies are capable of being separate (or even of actually being separate). [For a more thorough account, see the Article titled “René Descartes: the Mind-Body Distinction” and for various different interpretations of Descartes’ argument see Van Cleve (1983); Wilson (1978); and Rozemond (1998)]

In his treatment of this argument, Arnauld questions the inference from our being able to clearly and distinctly conceive of mind and body as separate to their actually being separable. Arnauld offers what he takes to be a counter-example. He claims:

Suppose someone knows for certain that the angle in a semi-circle is a right angle, and hence that the triangle formed by this angle and the diameter of the circle is right angled. In spite of this, he may doubt, or not yet grasped as certain, that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides; indeed he may even deny this if he is misled by some fallacy. But now, if he uses the same argument as that proposed by our illustrious author, he may appear to have confirmation of his false belief, as follows: ‘I clearly and distinctly perceive’, he may say, ‘that the triangle is right-angled’; but I doubt that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides; therefore it does not belong to the essence of the triangle that the square on its hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other sides.’ (CSM II 141-142/AT VII 201-202)

Arnauld offers an objection to Descartes’ argument using what Arnauld takes to be a different case with an analogous structure. Arnauld thinks that in his case, the conclusion is clearly untenable and so Descartes’ argument must be mistaken. Arnauld argues that given Descartes’ argument it seems that it is possible for there to be a right triangle in which the square of the hypotenuse is not equal to the sum of the squares of the other two sides, in other words a right triangle that does not reflect Pythagoras’ Theorem. Arnauld argues: imagine someone considers a right triangle, but doubts whether the square of the hypotenuse is equal to the sum of the squares of the other two sides. Arnauld claims that using Descartes’ argument, since one clearly and distinctly conceives of a right triangle without recognizing that it instantiates Pythagoras’ Theorem, then one could conclude that a right triangle could exist that does not instantiate Pythagoras’ Theorem; a conclusion that is surely untenable.

Arnauld suggests that Descartes’ only reply is to claim that he does not clearly and distinctly perceive that the triangle is right angled. Arnauld continues: “But how is my perception of the nature of my mind any clearer than his perception of the nature of a triangle” (CSM II 142/AT VII 202). So, Arnauld suggests, either we can never know when we have a clear and distinct idea or Descartes’ principle suffers some counter-examples. Whether Arnauld’s objection is successful is a difficult question and one that cannot be covered here. However, briefly, it seems that Descartes’ reply to Arnauld is at least prima facie effective (and possibly a central text in offering a proper interpretation of Descartes’ argument). Descartes claims that “we can clearly and distinctly understand that a triangle in a semi-circle is right-angled without being aware that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides” and compares this to “clearly and distinctly perceive[ing] the mind without the body and the body without the mind” (CSM II 158/AT VII 224-225). Van Cleve (1983, p. 39) helpfully explains the difference (what occurs between the ‘ ’ is the content of the clear and distinct perception):

(a)    Clearly and distinctly perceiving ‘A’ without clearly and distinctly perceiving ‘B’

(b)   Clearly and distinctly perceiving ‘A without B’

So, it seems that Descartes is claiming in the case of mind and body that (b) holds. That is, we can have a clear and distinct perception with the content: “mind without body and body without mind”. In Arnauld’s cases, we only have a clear and distinct perception of a “right triangle” such that we fail to notice that it instantiates Pythagoras’ Theorem. In order for Arnauld’s case to be a true counter-example, we would need to be able to have a clear and distinct perception with the content “right triangle that does not instantiate Pythagoras’ Theorem” and Descartes would deny that we have any such perception.

Arnauld’s objection to Descartes seems to still be a central problem for conceivability-based accounts of the epistemology of modality (see, for example, Yablo 1993, p. 2). A conceivability-based account of the epistemology of modality is one in which our epistemic access to modal claims (that is, claims about possibility, essence, necessity, and so forth) are grounded in our faculty of conceiving of certain states of affairs. Indeed, the conceivability-possibility principle holds that if a state of affairs is conceivable, then it is possible. This principle seems ubiquitous in philosophy, not the least in many thought experiments. The problem akin to Arnauld’s objection is coming up with an internally verifiable criterion for the right sort of conceivability that does not admit of counter-examples. Interestingly, Arnauld ultimately would agree with Descartes and accept that clear and distinct perception was sufficient to establish a real distinction between mind and body (see for example, Schmaltz 1996, pp. 14). Arnauld’s objection to Descartes is of central importance, both historically and philosophically.

A second prominent objection from the Fourth Objections concerns the structure of the Meditations. Arnauld was the first to argue that Descartes’ argument in the Meditations is circular. Arnauld claims:

I have one further worry, namely how the author avoids reasoning in a circle when he says that we are sure that what we clearly and distinctly perceive is true only because God exists.

But we can be sure that God exists only because we clearly and distinctly perceive this. Hence, before we can be sure that God exists, we ought to be able to be sure that whatever we perceive clearly and evidently is true. (CSM II 150/AT VII 214)

The worry pointed to by Arnauld has become known as the ‘Cartesian Circle’. Arnauld asks, how can Descartes avoid arguing in a circle when, in the Meditations, he seems to both rely on a certain type of idea, namely clear and distinct ideas, to argue for God’s existence, while at the same time, using God to validate those clear and distinct ideas? In other words, Descartes’ proof for God’s existence depends on Descartes trusting his clear and distinct ideas and he relies on God to validate those clear and distinct ideas. It is possible, however, that there is no such circle in Descartes (indeed, Descartes’ response to Arnauld is key to understanding the Meditations and how Descartes does not argue in a circle). Nevertheless, there are passages that suggest that Descartes argues in a circle. For example, in the Fifth Mediation, Descartes claims: “if I were unaware of God…I should never have true and certain knowledge of anything, but only shifting and changeable opinions” (CSM II 48/AT VII 69). Regardless of one’s take on the Cartesian Circle, it is among the most well-known and oft-written about topics in Descartes scholarship and Arnauld was the first to articulate the worry.

Arnauld goes on to express a concern about Descartes’ dualism. This concern is motivated by the fact that Descartes argues that the mind and the body are entirely different sorts of substances, with nothing in common whatsoever. Arnauld worries that by exaggerating the distinction between the mind and body, Descartes renders the body an overly inconsequential part of our selves claiming “that man is merely a rational soul and the body merely a vehicle for the soul – a view which gives rise to the definition of a man as ‘a soul which makes use of a body’” (CSM II 143/AT VII 203). Arnauld is concerned, with this objection, to make sure that on Descartes’ account the human body is a legitimate whole.

b. The Nature of Arnauld’s Cartesianism


As it has been noted above, Arnauld’s philosophy is clearly Cartesian. However, the extent to which he is a Cartesian is less clear. There are three general accounts of Arnauld’s commitment to Cartesianism. Traditionally, Arnauld had been interpreted as an uncritical and orthodox Cartesian (some readings go so far as to suggest that Arnauld treated Descartes as almost scripture). Marjorie Greene, for example, claims that Arnauld “would indeed prove for more than half a century the defender of pure Cartesian doctrine as he read it” (Grene 1998, p. 172). Other defenders of this general reading (although not as strong as Grene’s claim) include Robinet (1991) and Gouhier (1978). A second reading of Arnauld’s Cartesianism is that Arnauld was a Cartesian merely nominally. That is, the enthusiasm for Cartesian philosophy on the part of Arnauld was merely in so far as it furthered some other ends of Arnauld’s, whether it be to resuscitate interest in the philosophy of Augustine or to further some purely religious doctrines associated with Jansenism. Thus, although Arnauld may have furthered Cartesianism, developed Cartesianism and popularized Cartesianism, to call Arnauld a Cartesian is, in the words of Miel, “to be a dupe to a label” (Miel 1969, p. 262). Third, Arnauld can be seen as a critical and innovative Cartesian. That is, as a philosopher who embraced, to some extent, a Cartesian world-view, but remained critical of Descartes’ views and developed aspects of the Cartesian world-view or abandoned them when he saw fit. The most prominent defenders of this interpretation of Arnauld are Nadler (1995) and Moreau (1999); see also Kremer (1996) and Faye (2005). It seems that the best reading of Arnauld is the third reading. Indeed, the account of Arnauld defended in this article is indicative of the third reading to the extent that Arnauld strays from Descartes on several important issues described below. [For a good discussion of Arnauld’s Cartesianism, see Nadler (1989), Chapter II.]

c. Arnauld's Cartesian Ontology: Dual Dualisms



Arnauld, like Descartes, has two exhaustive and exclusive dualisms at the foundation of his ontology, namely a substance-mode ontology and a mind-body substance dualism. Arnauld’s commitment to a substance-mode ontology is clear in Book I, Chapter 2 of the Logic, where he claims:

I call whatever is conceived as subsisting by itself and as the subject of everything conceived about it, a thing. It is otherwise called a substance.

I call a manner of a thing, or mode, or attribute, or quality, that which, conceived as in the thing and not able to subsist without it, determines it to be a certain way and causes it to be so named.  (B 30/OA 41 46-47).

Arnauld is endorsing a substance-mode Cartesian ontology. Substances have two features. First, a substance is something which subsists by itself. Arnauld explains that by subsisting by itself, a substance needs “no other subject to exist” (B 31/OA 41 47). Arnauld holds that substances have independent ontic existence (relying only on God). The second feature of a substance is that it is the subject of everything conceived about it. That is, whatever features or properties the substance is conceived to have depend on the substance for their existence.

The second ontic category is that of modes. Modes cannot subsist on their own and are in a substance. In another passage Arnauld explains that modes “can exist naturally only through a substance” (Book I, Chapter 7, B 43/OA 41 64). Following Descartes, Arnauld defines modes as those things that rely on other things for their existence. Modes are different ways that substances can be (K 6/OA 38 184).

Arnauld, like Descartes, also endorses substance dualism, or the view that minds and bodies are the only two types of substances. That minds and bodies are the only two types of substances is a favorite example of Arnauld’s throughout the Logic. In Book 1, Chapter 7, he claims “body and mind are the two species of substance.” In Book II, Chapter 15, Arnauld claims “every substance is a body or a mind” (B 42/OA 41 61; B 123/OA 41 161). In fact, Arnauld tells Leibniz “I am acquainted with only two kinds of substances, bodies and minds; and it is up to those who would claim that there are others to prove it to us” (M 134/G II 107). Minds, for Arnauld, are essentially thinking things, while bodies are essentially extended things (see, for example, B 31-32/OA 41 135). In other words, what it is to be a mind just is to be a thinking thing and what it is to be a body just is to be an extended thing.

3. Philosophical Methodology




Another area of Arnauld's philosophy that reveals his commitment to Cartesianism is his philosophical methodology. Two of the most illuminating discussions of Arnauld's methodology occur throughout the Logic (especially Book IV) and the early chapters of VFI.

In Book IV of the Logic, Arnauld lists four rules useful for guarding against error when we try to find the truth in human sciences (L1, for Logic 1, and so forth):

L1. Never accept anything as true that is not known evidently to be so.

L2. Divide each of the difficulties being presented into as many parts as possible, and as may be required to solve them.

L3. To proceed by ordering our thoughts, beginning with the simplest and the most easily known objects, in order to rise step by step, as if by degrees, to knowledge of the most complex, assuming an order even among those that do not precede one another naturally.

L4. Always make enumerations so complete and reviews so comprehensive that we can be sure to leave nothing out. (B 238/OA 41 367-368) In Chapter I of VFI, Arnauld offers seven “rules which we ought to keep in mind in order to seek the truth” (K 3/OA 38 181).

The rules are (V1 for VFI 1, and so forth):

V1. The first is to begin with the simplest and clearest things, such that we cannot doubt about them provided that we pay attention to them.

V2. The second, to not muddy what we know clearly by introducing confused notions in the attempt to explain it further.

V3. The third is not to seek for reasons ad infinitum; but to stop when we know what belongs to the nature of the thing, or at least to be a certain quality of it.

V4. The fourth is not to ask for definitions of terms which are clear in themselves, and which we could only render more obscure by trying to define them, because we could explicate them only by those less clear.

V5. The fifth is not to confuse the questions which ought to be answered by giving the formal cause, with those that ought to be answered by giving the efficient cause, and not to seek the formal cause of the formal cause, which is a source of many errors, but rather to reply at that point by giving the efficient cause.

V6. The sixth is to take care not to think of minds as being like bodies or bodies as being like minds, attributing to one what pertains to the other.

V7. The seventh, not to multiply beings without necessity. (K 3-4/OA 38 181-182)

Later in VFI, Arnauld adds some “axioms” that compliment and/or add to his method. These axioms include (the axiom numbers as listed here do not correspond with the numbers as listed in VFI, A1 for Axiom 1, and so forth):

A1. Nothing should make us doubt something if we know that it is so with entire certainty, no matter what difficulties can be put forward against it.

A2.  Nothing is more certain than our knowledge of what takes place in our soul when we pause there. It is very certain, for example, that I conceive of bodies when I think I conceive of bodies, even though it may not be certain that the bodies that I conceive either truly exist, or are such as I conceive them to be.

A3.  It is certain, either by reason, assuming that God is not a deceiver, or at least by faith, that I have a body and that the earth, the sun, the moon and many other bodies which I know as existing outside of my mind, truly exist outside my mind.

There is much of interest in this set of rules. One aspect that is immediately noticeable is how similar and indebted to Descartes these rules are. Although it would be beyond the scope of this article to offer a full investigation and comparison of Arnauld’s method to Descartes’, there are a few aspects of the relation that are worth noting. Rules L1-L4 are taken from Descartes’ Discourse on Method and identified as such by Arnauld and Nicole. In the Discourse on Method, Descartes offers his method “of rightly conducting one’s reason and seeking truth in the sciences” (CSM I 111/AT VI 1). In the Discourse, Descartes is openly critical of the education (although certainly not entirely dismissive) he received while studying at one of the better schools in Europe at the time. Descartes offers his own rules as a replacement for the method he had been taught (CSM I 120/AT VI 18-19). Descartes is often considered the “Father of Modern Philosophy” and this title is not without merit, at least in part because of his method. Arnauld’s explicit endorsement of the method offered by Descartes in the Discourse on Method shows Arnauld’s embrace of the new method in philosophy.

The rules from VFI are very similar to those from Descartes’ Rules for the Direction of the Mind (henceforth: Rules; CSM I 9-78/AT X 359-472). For example, V1 above is very similar (if not simply a restatement) of Rule 5 of Descartes’ Rules, where Descartes claims that we should “reduce complicated and obscure propositions step by step to simple ones, and then, starting with the intuition of the simplest ones of all try to ascend through the same steps to knowledge of all the rest” (Nadler 1989, p. 34 makes this point). V1 is an explicit mention of Descartes’ Method of Doubt (the method Descartes uses in the Meditations), as Arnauld wants to rely on things that we cannot doubt in his method. In V2, Arnauld warns of not introducing confused notions to understand what we already know clearly. It is further noteworthy that in his explanation of Rule 4, Arnauld explicitly mentions Descartes.

In V6, Arnauld claims that one must be very clear to distinguish between bodies and minds and not attribute what belongs to one to the other. For example, Arnauld would argue that thought pertains to minds and extension belongs to body. It is a mistake to think of bodies as thinking or minds as extended. In V7, Arnauld endorses what is often called Ockham’s Razor, or the principle that one ought not introduce things into one’s ontology when there is no need to do so. This is no doubt in the background of Arnauld’s dismissal of Leibniz’s “forms” discussed in section 1c. Arnauld thinks not only that these forms are vague, but also that they are unhelpful and unnecessary.

In the axioms from VFI, specifically A1, Arnauld claims that “nothing should make us doubt something if we know it with entire certainty” even if this leads to other difficulties. Arnauld employs this principle often in the Logic. For example, in the Logic, Arnauld claims:

How to understand that the smallest bit of matter is infinitely divisible and that one can never arrive at a part that is so small that not only does it not contain several others, but that it does not contain an infinity of parts; that the smallest grain of wheat contains in itself as many parts, although proportionately smaller, as the entire world…all these things are inconceivable, and yet they must necessarily be true, since the infinite divisibility of matter has been demonstrated. (B 231/OA 41 359)

Here Arnauld applies A1 to the claim that matter is infinitely divisible. Arnauld takes it that it has been proven that matter is infinitely divisible. Yet, it is inconceivable how this is so. We should not doubt this, however, no matter what difficulties are put forward concerning it. This is because it has been demonstrated. Arnauld goes on to relate this same principle to God and God’s omnipotence:

The benefit we can derive from these speculations is not just to acquire this kind of knowledge [extension’s being infinitely divisible]…but to teach us to recognize the limits of the mind, and to make us admit in spite of ourselves that some things exist even though we cannot understand them. This is why it is good to tire the mind on these subtleties, in order to master its presumption and to take away its audacity ever to oppose our feeble insight to the truths presented by the Church, under the pretext that we cannot understand them. For since all the vigor of the human mind is forced to succumb to the smallest atom of matter, and to admit that it clearly sees that it is infinitely divisible without being able to understand how that can be, is it not obviously to sin against reason to refuse to believe the marvelous effects of God’s omnipotence, which is itself incomprehensible, for the reason that the mind cannot understand them. (B 233/OA 41 361).

Here, Arnauld claims that God’s omnipotence and it effects are incomprehensible, yet this should not cause of to doubt that God is omnipotent. We shall return to this point in section 5a.

[See Nadler (1989), Chapter II.3 for a great discussion of the methodology and its relation to Cartesianism].

4. Occasionalism

One of the key questions facing Cartesian dualism is how the mind and body, being so radically different, could causally interact. While there is some debate about the exact nature of Descartes’ position, the dominant reading is that he held mind-body interactionism—the view that the mind and body causally interact with one another. As discussed in section 2c, Arnauld also held mind-body substance dualism.  It is not surprising then that Arnauld inherited some of the same questions concerning interaction from Descartes. There is also debate about Arnauld’s view in this respect, and whether Arnauld followed Descartes and embraced interactionism or abandoned interactionism in favor of a version of occasionalism.

As discussed in section 1c, the traditional doctrine of occasionalism has two components:

  1. Finite beings have no causal power.
  2. God is the only true causal agent.

Arnauld clearly rejects both 1 and 2. Arnauld holds that finite minds have causal power. Thus, it may seem odd to attribute occasionalism to Arnauld. However, consider the following two claims:@

  1. Finite minds have no causal power over bodies and bodies have no causal power over minds.
  2. God is the only true causal agent with respect to mind-body causal relations.

The conjunction of 3 and 4, or mind-body occasionalism, is occasionalism with respect to only a certain type of causal relations, namely mind-body causal relations.

The traditional reading of Arnauld is as a mind-body interactionist. The most sophisticated defense of this reading is A. R. Ndiaye’s. He argues that despite his occasionalist vernacular, Arnauld is in the tradition of Descartes, not in the occasionalist tradition (Ndiaye 1991, p. 308).

While Ndiaye’s interpretation deserves treatment, Nadler (1995) has convincingly argued that, at least by the end of his career, Arnauld was a mind-body occasionalist (the following account is taken from Nadler 1995). As pointed out by Nadler, in the Examen Arnauld argues that mental states and bodily states correspond in an interesting way. We have certain mental states, like pain, on the occasion of certain bodily states, like burning flesh. Arnauld argues that such a correspondence needs an explanation; that is, Arnauld claims that there must be some reason for this correlation between certain types of bodily events and certain types of mental states. Arnauld suggests only three possible explanations:

(a) Bodies cause mental states.

(b) The mind causes its own mental states on the occasion of certain bodily states.

(c) God causes mental states on the occasion of certain physical states.

The three options Arnauld gives make perfect sense given Arnauld's mind-body substance dualism. The only created substances that exist are minds and bodies and of course God exists as well. Given that these are the only things that exist, the three above options seem to be the only three possibilities to explain the correspondence between mental states and bodily states (short of coincidence). Either minds are responsible, bodies are responsible or God is responsible. Arnauld begins by denying that bodies cause mental states, arguing:

For the movement of a body can have at most no other real effect than to move another body, I say at most, for possibly it cannot even do that, for who does not see that a body cannot at all have causal relations with a spiritual soul [qui ne voit qu’il n’en peut causer aucun sur une ame spirituelle] which is incapable, by its nature, of being pushed or moved? (E 99/OA 38 146)

Arnauld clearly denies that bodies can exercise causal power over minds. Thus, Arnauld has eliminated the first possibility. Arnauld then proceeds to consider the second possibility and claims that the mind does not cause its own perception on the occasion of certain bodily states, for the mind could not “ha[ve] such a power to give itself all the perceptions of sensible objects” to “produce them so properly and with so marvelous a promptitude” (OA 38 147/E 101/trans. Nadler 1995, p. 135). In other words, the human mind cannot cause the correct sensations so consistently and so unerringly. How would the human mind know what sensations to cause and when? Since Arnauld argues there are only three possibilities (namely a, b and c above) and the first two do not work (namely, a and b), it must be that God causes them:

It only remains for us to understand that it must be that God desired to oblige himself to cause in our soul all the perceptions of sensible qualities every time certain motions occur in the sense organs, according to the laws that he himself has established in nature (emphasis mine, E 101-102/OA 38 147-148; translation Nadler 1995, p. 136).

Arnauld’s account, at least with respect to body→mind causal relations is occasionalist. God causes our mental states on the occasion of certain bodily states every time these bodily states occur.

As pointed out by Nadler, there is another work in which Arnauld does address mind→body causal relations, namely the Dissertation. In the Dissertation, Arnauld claims:

Our soul does not know what needs to be done to move our is properly only this reason…that can lead one to believe that it is not our soul that moves our arm. (OA 38 690/trans. Nadler 1995, pp. 138-139)

This is not an argument for occasionalism, as all Arnauld claims is that finite minds do not causally affect bodies. However, Arnauld has only three options open to explain the correspondence of mental states and physical states: finite minds, bodies or God. Bodies certainly do not have the capacity to recognize what to do on the occasion of states of the soul. Minds do not have the requisite knowledge to produce their own perceptions on the occasion of certain bodily states, so a fortiori, bodies would not have such a capacity (see Nadler 1995, p. 138). Thus, given that Arnauld denies that finite minds causally affect bodies, the only option available to explain the correspondence is God.

These passages illustrate Arnauld’s commitment to mind-body occasionalism. In fact, they illustrate that Arnauld’s mind-body occasionalism is an ad hoc response to some form of the problem of interaction (see Nadler 1995, pp. 142-143). Arnauld argues that it is clear that minds do not causally affect bodies and that bodies do not causally affect minds, so God must be responsible for the causal interaction.

Concerning body-body causation, Arnauld is less clear in his position. Nadler has suggested that Arnauld seems to allow body-body causal relations. Indeed, he cites the passage: “For the movement of a body can have at most no other real effect than to move another body” to suggest that Arnauld seems to hold that bodies do have causal power (Nadler 1995, p. 132). However, Arnauld follows this claim up with “I say at most, for possibly it cannot even do that.” There appears to be no text that establishes Arnaud’s view on the matter, but the hesitation in this passage may suggest that Arnauld was not completely satisfied with the possibility of body-body causal relations and at least would entertain the notion that body-body causal relations were occasionalist.

[Secondary literature: Ndiaye (1991); Watson (1987); Robinet (1991); Nadler (1995); Kremer (1996); Sleigh (1990).]

5. Conception of God and Theodicy

As noted in the introduction, Arnauld was primarily a theologian. Combining Arnauld’s focus on theological issues and his philosophical acumen, one might expect that Arnauld had especially interesting philosophical discussions and views pertaining to God, God’s modus operandi and theodicy. If so, one would not be disappointed. Two questions concerning Arnauld’s views on God are of particular importance. First, did Arnauld follow Descartes and endorse the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths. Second, what contributions, if any, did Arnauld make to the problem of theodicy and an account of God’s modus operandi.

a. The Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths



One of the most contested issues in Arnauld scholarship is whether Arnauld followed Descartes in endorsing the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths (henceforth: CET). Descartes first defends this position in a series of letters to Mersenne in 1630. For example, Descartes claims:

You ask me by what kind of causality God established the eternal truths. I reply: by the same kind of causality as he created all things, that is to say, as their efficient and total cause. For it is certain that he is the author of the essence of created things no less than their existence; and the essence is nothing other than the eternal truths…You ask what necessitated God to create these truths; and I reply that he was free to make it not true that all the radii of the circle are equal – just as free as he was not to create the world. And it is certain that these truths are no more necessarily attached to his essence than are other created things. You ask what God did in order to produce them. I reply that from all eternity he willed and understood them to be, and by that very fact he created them…In God, willing, understanding and creating are all the same thing without one being prior to the other even conceptually. (AT 1 152-153/CSMK III 25-26)

How to interpret CET is a difficult question in its own right. Eternal truths are truths like those of mathematics, for example, 2+2=4, and those about essences, for example, Descartes is a thinking thing. These sorts of truths are usually considered to be necessarily true. That is, they are considered to be truths that could not have been false. Yet, in this passage, Descartes seems to suggest that the eternal truths were created by God in such a way that they could have been false. There are many different interpretations of Descartes’ account of CET, three of which are especially worth noting. On one reading of CET, popularized by Frankfurt (1977), to claim that God freely created the eternal truths is to claim that all truths, even the eternal truths, are contingent. A second interpretation, popularized by Curley, holds that Descartes is not denying that the eternal truths are necessary, but rather that they are necessarily necessary (Curley 1984). Finally, a third interpretation, defended by Kaufman, holds that Descartes’ claim that God freely created the eternal truths is simply to claim that there were no factors, independent of God that compelled God to create the eternal truths as they were in fact created. Kaufman argues, however, that this is consistent with these truths being necessarily true (Kaufman 2002, p. 38). What is central to the doctrine on all three readings is that there is a legitimate sense in which God was free in creating the eternal truths and had the capacity to create them differently (or at least to not create them).

While Arnauld never explicitly addresses CET, whether he endorses it is the focus of much Arnauld scholarship. Interpretations vary from Andrew Robinet’s claim that “Arnauld offers a tranquil Cartesianism, which is not confused by the eternal truths” (Robinet 1991, p. 8), to Nadler’s suggestion that (depending on one’s interpretation of Descartes) Arnauld could be “seen as going further than Descartes, recognizing the truly radical potential of the Cartesian doctrine [CET] and embracing it” (Nadler 2008, p. 536), to Emmanuel Faye’s interpretation that “Arnauld’s doctrinal position” concerning the creation of the eternal truths “is not Cartesian but Thomist, even if it is, in actuality, a nuanced Thomism” (Faye 2005, p. 208), to Tad Schmaltz’s claim that “Arnauld never did take a stand on [the creation of the eternal truths]” (Schmaltz 2002, pp. 15-16).

Before discussing whether Arnauld adopted CET, three other views about God that Arnauld endorses should be addressed, namely the Principle of Divine Incomprehensibility (PDI), the Doctrine of Equivocity and the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity. All three of these views are held by Descartes (although they are not necessarily unique to Cartesianism, and attributing the Doctrine of Equivocity to Descartes is controversial). Further, all three views are relevant to Descartes’ acceptance of CET and to Arnauld’s account of God.

The Principle of Divine Incomprehensibility is the thesis that:

PDI:    (a) We ought to believe everything that is revealed by God.

(b) The fact that we cannot understand how something revealed by God can come about should not deter us from believing it because a finite intelligence ought not to expect to understand the nature or causal power of an infinite being. (Kremer 1996, p. 84)

In the Examen Arnauld directly endorses PDI:

Whatever God has been pleased to reveal to us about himself or about the extraordinary effects of his omnipotence ought to take first place in our belief even though we cannot conceive it, for it is not strange that our mind, being finite, cannot comprehend what an infinite power is capable of. (OA 38, 90/E 12/trans. Kremer 1996, p. 77)

In this passage Arnauld explicitly defends both components of PDI. We should believe everything revealed to us by God and we should believe it even if we cannot understand it because we ought not expect our finite intellect to be able to understand the infinite. In fact, Arnauld holds a view stronger than PDI, claiming that things God reveals to us ought to be placed first in our beliefs (see Kremer 1996, p. 88 fn. 5). Arnauld’s claim here is without doubt related to axiom A1 and his discussion of God and God’s omnipotence from section 3. Arnauld takes it that we know that God is omnipotent and that we should believe everything revealed to us by God even if we cannot understand how it can be true.

Arnauld also endorses the Doctrine of Equivocity or the thesis that predicates when applied to God and finite things have at most equivocal meanings and not at all univocal meanings. That is, to say that God is powerful and to say that Alexander the Great is powerful are to say entirely different things about God and Alexander the Great. In this context, “powerful” means something entirely different when applied to God and when applied to Alexander the Great. Properties that are possessed by God and by finite things, are at best equivocally similar properties. At the conclusion of a discussion about the Eucharist (see section 1b) and its relation to Cartesian philosophy in the Examen, Arnauld adds:

But I add before finishing…nothing would be more unreasonable than to hold that philosophers, who have the right to follow the light of reason in the human sciences, are required to take what is incomprehensible in the mystery of the Incarnation as a rule for their opinion when they attempt to explain the natural union of the soul with the body, as if the soul could do with regard to the body what the eternal Word could do with regard to the humanity he took on, even though the power, as will as the wisdom, of the eternal Word is infinite, while the power of the soul over the body to which it is joined is very limited. We would not have those thoughts which mix up everything in philosophy and theology, if we were more convinced of the clear and certain maxim that Cardinal Bellarmine used against the quibbles of the Socinians: “No inference can be made from the finite to the infinite,” or as others put it “there is no proportion [proportio] between the finite and the infinite”. (OA 38 175/E 141, trans. Carraud 1996, p. 9)

In this passage, Arnauld is defending the Doctrine of Equivocity. Arnauld cites as a “clear and certain maxim” that no inference can be made from the finite to the infinite, and considers it the same claim as there being “no proportion [proportio] between the finite and the infinite.” While attributing the Doctrine of Equivocity to Arnauld is controversial, to claim that there is no proportio (“proportion”, while most naturally translated “proportion” can also mean “analogy” or “symmetry”) between the finite and the infinite is at least prima facie to claim that properties of God and created things are in no way similar. [See, Nadler (2008), p. 533 and Carraud (1995), pp. 122-123 for a discussion of equivocity in Arnauld]. At the very least, Arnauld flatly denies the claim that predicates apply to God and creatures univocally. For properties to apply to God and creatures univocally is for those properties to be essentially the same kind of properties. Although God is infinite and creatures finite, according to the Doctrine of Univocity, what it is for God to have knowledge and for creatures to have knowledge is roughly the same (see Nadler 2008b, pp. 204-207 and Moreau 2000, p. 104).

Arnauld also endorses the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity, or the view that God is absolutely simple. For Arnauld, to claim that God is simple is, among other things, to deny any real distinction between God’s will, God’s understanding and God. God’s will and understanding are one and the same thing; God’s will just is God’s understanding. In addition, Arnauld’s version of divine simplicity is such that it is not the case that God’s will and understanding performing different functions in God’s action and creation. While the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity was ubiquitous among Arnauld’s contemporaries and predecessors, many seem to not require this latter claim as a component in divine simplicity. Arnauld's account of divine simplicity appears both in the correspondence with Leibniz and the debate with Malebranche. In the latter, for example, Arnauld offers this account of divine simplicity while arguing against Malebranche’s conception of God. In discussing God’s creation, Malebranche describes God as “consulting his wisdom.” In the Treatise Malebranche explains: “The wisdom of God reveals to him an infinity of ideas of different works, and all the possible ways of executing his plans” (OC 5 28/R116; for a nice summary of Malebranche’s theodicy, see Rutherford 2000). Thus, Malebranche has an account where God consults his understanding, considers the many different ways that he could create, and selects one.

Arnauld objects to this conception of God and God’s action in many ways. For example, Arnauld claims it is not appropriate to say that God: “’consults his wisdom’, and it is from there that it happens that all that He wills is wise.” For, Arnauld claims, God does not need to consult his wisdom in order to be wise, “everything that he wills” is “essentially wise as soon as he wills it” (OA 39 578/Nadler 2008, p. 531). Arnauld further claims that: “Can there be a thought more unworthy of God than to imagine such a disagreement between his wisdom and his will as if his will and his wisdom were not the same thing?” (OA 39 748/Moreau 2000, p. 103, trans. Nadler). In these passages, Arnauld is articulating his conception of God such that God’s different faculties do not play different roles in creation; God is absolutely simple. [See also Nelson (1993), pp. 685-688; Moreau (1999), especially pp. 280-286; Moreau (2000), especially section 4.3, pp. 102-104; and Nadler (2008), p. 533, for discussion of Arnauld and divine simplicity]

There is strong evidence that Arnauld endorsed the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity, Equivocity and PDI. In fact, it seems the text demands that Arnauld held divine simplicity and PDI and at least strongly supported the Doctrine of Equivocity. Returning to whether Arnauld also adopted the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths, the dominant view is that Arnauld denied CET (see for example Kremer 1996, Gouhier 1978, and Robinet 1991). Carraud (1996) and Schmaltz (2002) have argued either that Arnauld never made up his mind, or at least that the texts give us no answer. Faye argues that what is “created” about the eternal truths is not that they depend on the free decrees of God. Rather, the eternal truths are created on account of the fact that the truth is known by the human intellect, which is a created intellect (Faye 2005, pp. 206-207). Moreau (1999) has offered a very compelling case that Arnauld did in fact accept CET that is endorsed (and developed) by Nadler (2009). While this is too difficult a question to adequately answer here, what is clear is that Arnauld holds the same underlying conception of God (for example, strong notion of divine simplicity, Equivocity and PDI) that Descartes relies on in his exposition of and defense of CET and his conception of God at least approaches the Cartesian God (see Nadler 2009, p. 533). Arnauld explicitly claims in his account of PDI that we cannot understand the causal power of an infinite being and in his defense of Equivocity argues that finite beings and God have no proportion to another. Finally, in his account of divine simplicity, Arnauld denies that God understands conceptually prior to God’s willing certain states of affairs. Given PDI it seems that Arnauld would at least not positively claim that there are things that God cannot do (for example, make 2+3=6) and given Equivocity and divine simplicity it seems that Arnauld would not conceive of God creating in the way that Malebranche and Leibniz, for example, would hold, namely by understanding all the possible ways of creating conceptually prior to willing to create. In the Logic (see section 3), Arnauld denies that we can understand God’s omnipotence. Put all of these aspects of Arnauld’s conception of God together and it seems that Arnauld’s conception of God at least approaches CET.

b. Theodicy

Arnauld’s most systematic contributions to the question of theodicy come in his criticisms of Malebranche’s theodicy. As such, it will be beneficial to first briefly examine Malebranche’s theodicy before considering Arnauld’s response and account. Malebranche begins by citing two features of an infinitely perfect being: a wisdom that has no limits and a power that nothing is capable of resisting (R 116/OC V 27). Malebranche’s God surveys all of the possible universes that God could create and chooses to create the one that is the best reflection of God’s attributes. Malebranche claims:

An excellent workman should proportion his action to his work; he does not accomplish by quite complex means that which he can execute by simpler ones; he does not act without an end, and never makes useless efforts. From this one must conclude that God, discovering in the infinite treasure of his wisdom an infinity of possible worlds (as the necessary consequences of the laws of motion which he can establish), determines himself to create that world which could have been produced and preserved by the simplest laws, and ought to be the most perfect, with respect to the simplicity of the ways necessary to its production or to its conservation. (R/OC V 28)

The aim in God’s creation of the world is not to create the world with the least amount of evil, but the world that is the best reflection of God and God’s attributes. God, being infinitely wise, ought to create a world that is produced and preserved by the simplest laws. God acts, as Malebranche likes to say, nearly always by ‘general volitions’ and very rarely by ‘particular volitions’. When confronted with evil in the world, God did not will that that evil exist by a particular volition, but only as a consequence of the general laws that God has willed due to their simplicity, that is, by a general volition. Malebranche goes so far as to say that “God’s wisdom in a sense renders Him impotent; for since it obliges Him to act by the most simple ways, it is not possible for all humans to be saved” (OC 5 47, trans. Nadler 2008, p. 525).

Many things about Malebranche’s theodicy upset Arnauld. Only several of Arnauld’s more prominent objections shall be discussed here. First and foremost, Arnauld objects to Malebranche’s theodicy because it limits God’s power. Arnauld was very adamant in his defense of divine power, so much so that he even criticizes Descartes, whose divine voluntarism is well-known, of limiting God’s power. In the New Objections to Descartes’ Meditations, Arnauld argues concerning Descartes’ claim that a vacuum is impossible: “I would rather acknowledge my ignorance than convince myself that God necessarily conserves all bodies, or at least that he cannot annihilate any one of them unless he at once creates another” (K 188/OA 38 75). Arnauld’s insistence on a strong conception of divine omnipotence continued throughout his career. He was critical of Malebranche’s theodicy because, he thought, it limits God’s power substantially. In the Reflexions, for example, Arnauld objects to Malebranche’s claim that God must choose the world with the simplest laws. In passages pointed out by Moreau (2000, p. 103), Arnauld claims of Malebranche’s theodicy and account of God’s action: “it is indeed strange that someone should so easily take the liberty to provide arbitrary boundaries to the freedom of God” and “He fears not to set limits to the freedom of God…He fears not to proclaim that…God will have no freedom in his choice of ways necessary for the execution of his designs…but on what basis could a doctrine so injurious to divine freedom be grounded?” (OA 39 603 and OA 39 594-595/both translations are Nadler’s and appear in Moreau 2000, p. 103). Overall, not only does this language undermine God’s omnipotence, but also humanizes his ways of acting. Arnauld claims: “All means for executing his designs are equally easy for God…and his power so renders him master of all things and so independent of the need for help from others, that it suffices that he will for his volitions to be executed” (OA 39 189-190/trans. Nadler 1996, p. 154, who points to this passage). Arnauld objects to Malebranche’s theodicy because he sees it as putting unnecessary and inappropriate constraints on God’s action and power

Arnauld also objects to Malebranche’s theodicy because Malebranche admits that evil exists in the world. According to Malebranche, there are legitimate evils in the world and these evils are allowed to exist by God. In fact, as noted above Malebranche is an occasionalist. Thus, it seems that God is causally responsible for evil. Arnauld, on the other hand, rejects this claim, insisting that apparent evils in the world are only appearances. Arnauld claims God’s work has no faults: “There are no faults in the works of God.” According to Arnauld, if we “consider the whole” world, or perhaps better, were we able to consider the whole, we would recognize that everything contributes to the overall beauty of the universe (OA 39 205/see also Nadler 1996, p. 156 who points to this passage).

Finally, Arnauld attacked Malebranche’s claim that God acts primarily by “general volitions” and very rarely by “particular volitions”. In a section of Malebranche’s Treatise added in a later addition to clarify the distinction (no doubt from Arnauld’s very objections), Malebranche defines what it means for God to act by a general volition and by a particular volition.

I say that God acts by general volitions, when he acts in consequence of general laws which he has established. For example, I say that God acts in me by general volitions when he makes me feel pain at the time I am pricked; because in consequence of the general and efficacious laws of the union of the soul and the body which he has established, he makes me feel pain when my body is ill-disposed. (R 195/OC V 147, I have replaced Riley’s “wills” with “volitions” for the French “volontez”)

He continues:

I say on the contrary that God acts by particular volitions when the efficacy of his volition is not determined at all by some general law to produce some effect. Thus, supposing that God makes me feel the pain of pinching without there happening in my body, or in any creature whatsoever, any changes which determine him to act in me according to general laws—I say then that God acts by particular volitions. (R 195/OC V 147-148, I have replaced “wills” and “will” with “volitions” and “volition”, respectively for the French “volontez” and “volonté”)


Arnauld argues that Malebranche’s claim that God acts almost always by general wills destroys God’s providential concern for creation. According to Arnauld, God acts according to general laws, but does not act by general laws (see, for example, OA 39 175).  Arnauld argues that in fact, God has a volition for every state of affairs in the world. Arnauld’s objection relies on interpreting Malebranche’s account of God’s acting by general volitions as one in which the contents of God general volitions are general laws. For example, on this reading the content of God’s volition might be “For all created substances x and y and for every time t1, if x is G at t1 and x bears relation R to y then there is a time t2 such that t2 bears relation T to t1 and y is F at t2” (this example is taken from Black 1997, p. 34). Thus on this reading, general volitions have contents which are laws. It is not clear that Arnauld interpreted Malebranche correctly in this regard. Indeed, a second plausible interpretation of Malebranche is that when Malebranche claims that God acts by general volitions, Malebranche means that God has particular content volitions in accordance with the natural laws (see Pessin 2001, for this very helpful way of explaining the distinction). So, Malebranche’s God would have a volitional content for every particular state of affairs of the world, but God’s volitional contents proceed according to general laws. If this latter reading is correct, then Arnauld’s objection seems to lack force as Malebranche does claim of God that God acts through general laws and not by general laws. What is clear is that Arnauld holds that God has a volitional content of every particular state of affairs of the world.

[For discussions of the correct interpretation of Malebranche in this respect see: Pessin (2001); Nadler (2000); Black (1997); and Stencil (2011)]

c. Arnauld’s God



If we combine the discussion of Arnauld’s commitments to his understanding of God from the two above discussions, we can see a distinction conception of God emerge. First and foremost, is Arnauld’s insistence that God (an infinite being) does not act in the way that created finite beings act. God’s understanding and will do not play different roles in creation or in God’s action. The necessity to consult one’s understanding before willing, having to balance different competing desires and not being able to achieve all of one’s ends is something that finite beings do, but not God. God is in this sense not a being with practical rationality (see for example, Nadler 2008, p. 518). Second, God created no evil (at least as a positive thing in the world). If we were capable of understanding creation in its entirety we would see that everything contributes to the greatness and beauty of the universe. And finally, from Arnauld’s objections to Malebranche’s theodicy, we can see that Arnauld holds that although God acts according to general laws, God does not act by general laws. God directly acts in every particular situation.

Before moving on, we are now finally in a position to consider Moreau’s suggestion as to why Arnauld begins his attack on Malebranche’s theodicy with an attack on Malebranche’s theory of ideas. From Arnauld’s perspective, Malebranche’s theory of ideas, especially his Vision in God doctrine and his theodicy are quite related. According to his Vision in God doctrine, created beings have ideas that are in a sense in God and Malebranche’s God acts much like created beings do, for example, by consulting his understanding. As Moreau (2000, pp. 104-106) argues, Arnauld sees both of these as an illegitimate understanding of God and endorsement of the Doctrine of Univocity. God has ideas that are in a sense accessible to us and acts in much the same way we do, according to Malebranche. These are both problematic for Arnauld, as he denies univocity between God and created beings. Indeed, if the above account is correct, he endorses equivocity.

6. Modality



In the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence, Arnauld not only offers many important objections to Leibniz’s view (some of which were outlined in section 1), but he also offers a positive account of modality. The best way to approach Arnauld's account is to consider one more of his objections to Leibniz.


Arnauld’s initial objection in his first letter revolves around Leibniz’s endorsement of the Complete Concept Theory of Substance (CCS). As Leibniz explains in the outline sent to Arnauld:


Since the individual concept of each person contains once for all everything that will ever happen to him, one sees in it a priori proofs or reasons for the truth of each event, or why one event has occurred rather than another. (M 5/G II 12)


Leibniz defends this view in the Discourse on Metaphysics:


We are able to say that this is the nature of an individual substance or of a complete being, namely, to afford a conception so complete that the concept shall be sufficient for the understanding of it and for the deduction of all the predicates of which the substance is or may become the subject. (D 13/G IV 349/AG 41)


CCS is the view that it is the nature of an individual substance to have a complete concept such that any true predication which can be made of that substance is contained in that substance’s concept. According to this view, not only is being a man contained in the concept of Caesar, but also that he crossed the Rubicon, that he was the subject of a biography by Plutarch and every other particular event in his life.

Arnauld adamantly objects to this principle:

If that is so, God was free to create or not create Adam; but supposing he wished to create him, everything that has happened since and will ever happen to the human race was and is obliged to happen through a more than fatal necessity. For the individual concept of Adam contained the consequence that he would have so many children, and the individual concept of each of these children, everything that they would do and all the children they would have: and so on. There is therefore no more liberty in God regarding all that, supposing he wished to create Adam, than in maintaining that God was free, supposing he wished to create me, not to create a nature capable of thought. (M 9/G II 15)

As with many of his objections to Malebranche, Arnauld is concerned that Leibniz’s view limits God’s power. Arnauld argues that once God has decided to create Adam, everything else that happens follows through necessity. This is because what is contained in Adam’s complete concept entails every other fact about the universe. For example, Adam’s complete concept entails not only that Caesar exist, but that Plutarch compose a treatise on Caesar. The reason is, or at least Arnauld seems to take it, that it is a true predication of Adam that Adam exists a certain number of years before Caesar. Since this is a true predication of Adam, and a complete concept of Adam (according to Leibniz) is sufficient to deduce all of Adam’s predicates; Caesar is either a part of Adam’s concept or straightaway follows from Adam’s concept. Arnauld finds this troubling. Not the least because he sees it as a threat to God’s omnipotence. Once God creates Adam, Arnauld claims, God is bound to create Caesar and everything else that God creates through a “more than fatal necessity.” Surely, Arnauld would claim, God could have created Adam and chosen not to create Caesar, or at least God could have created Caesar and Plutarch, but Plutarch wrote a biography on Aristotle instead. Arnauld treats this as an unacceptable limitation on God's power.

Leibniz responds, and among other things, offers his account of creation. Leibniz sums up the relevant part of his account of creation in the Monadology: “There is an infinity of possible universes in God’s ideas, and since only one of them can exist, there must be a sufficient reason for God’s choice which determines him towards one thing rather than another” (AG 220/G IV 615-616). Much like Malebranche, Leibniz considers that God’s creation takes place by God considering the possible ways that God could create. God’s decision to create is not piecemeal, as Leibniz claims: “one must not consider God’s will to create a particular Adam separate from all the others which he has regarding Adam’s children and the whole of the human race” (M 14/G IV 19). Leibniz continues that had God wanted to create a world with “Adam” and a different posterity, God would have created a different Adam with a different complete concept. Leibniz holds that God created in the best possible way from an infinite number of options. In these infinite different universes that God could create, there are many different “Adams” and in some of those worlds there are “Caesars” and in some there are not.

Ultimately, Arnauld concedes to Leibniz’s account of a complete concept, but the concession is only a terminological one. It turns out the real debate between the two is about the nature of possibility. As Arnauld tells Leibniz:

It was more than enough to make me decide to confess to you in good faith that I am satisfied by the way you explain what had at first shocked me regarding the concept of an individual nature…I see no other difficulties remaining except on the possibility of things, and this way of conceiving of God as having chosen the universe that he has created amongst an infinite number of other possible universes that he saw at the same time and did not wish to create. But as that strictly has no bearing upon the concept of the individual nature and since I should have to ponder too long to make clear what my views on the subject are, or rather what I take exception to in the ideas of others, because they do not seem to me to be worthy of God, you will think it advisable, Sir, that I say nothing about it. (M 77/G II 64)

As convincingly argued by Alan Nelson (1993), the debate between Leibniz and Arnauld is a debate between a possibilist (Leibniz) and an actualist (Arnauld). Possibilism is the view that there is an ontic distinction between two types of existing things: actual things and possible things. Actualism is the view that the only things that exist are actual things. According to Leibniz, prior to the creation of the universe, God considers all of the possible universe that God could create and chooses the best of those worlds and creates it. The world that God creates is the actual world. In addition to the actual world, there are an infinite number of merely possible worlds, which exist but only in God’s mind. In the above passage Arnauld offers his disagreement with this way of conceiving of God's creating: “I see no other difficulties remaining except on...this way of conceiving of God as having chosen the universe that he has created amongst an infinite number of other possible universes.” Nelson (1993, p. 686) has helpfully suggested keeping Arnauld's endorsement of the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity in mind in this passage. As argued in the section 5a, Arnauld held a view of divine simplicity such that God's different faculties do not play different roles in God's acting. Leibniz's God, given that he surveys his understanding prior (at least conceptually) to his willing to create, has faculties participating in God's action in different ways. This Arnauld sees as an unacceptable way to conceive of God and so there are no possible worlds in God’s mind that are not created.

After Arnauld objects to Leibniz’s account of creation and the existence of possible worlds in God’s understanding on account of its reliance on a view whereby God’s understanding and will are distinct (see M 27-33/G II 28-33), Arnauld then offers an actualist account:

I confess in good faith that I have no conception of these purely possible substances, that is to say, the ones that God will never create. And I am very much inclined to think that they are figments of the imagination that we create, and that what we call possible, purely possible, substances, cannot be anything other than God’s omnipotence, which being a pure act does not permit the existence in it of any possibility [et que tout ce que nous appelons substances possibles, purement possibles, ne peut être autre chose que la toute-puissance de Dieu, qui étant un pur acte ne souffre point qu’il y ait en lui aucune possibilité]. (M 31/G II 31-32)

Arnauld continues:

But one can conceive of possibilities in the natures which [God] has I can also do with an infinite number of modifications which are in the power of these created natures, such as the thoughts of intelligent natures and the forms of extended substance. (M 31-32/G I 32, see also Nelson 1993, p. 685 who points to this passage)

The view suggested by Arnauld is that all that exists are God and actual substances and all possibility exists in virtue of the modal properties or “powers” of actually existing substances. Prior to God’s creation, there are no ‘possible worlds’ in God’s understanding from which God chooses to create. Instead, God creates all actual things and possibility is grounded in these actual things and their powers. For example, Arnauld would claim, it is possible for Descartes to have written 7 meditations, instead of 6. This is not because God could have chosen to create a Descartes who wrote 7 meditations, but because it is in the power of the actually created Descartes that he could have written a 7th meditation.

7. Conclusion

Antoine Arnauld was a major figure in the intellectual landscape of the latter part of the 17th century. Although he has not received the attention that others have, for example, Descartes, Leibniz and Spinoza, Arnauld is finally starting to receive the attention he so rightly deserves from scholars. Arnauld was arguably the most philosophically gifted Cartesian of the latter part of the 17th century and explicitly defended Cartesianism even after Descartes’ works had been put on the index. His Objections to Descartes’ Meditations are arguably the best of any set. He went on to co-author an extremely influential logic text with Pierre Nicole. His correspondence with Leibniz, where he simultaneously pushes Leibniz to explain his position, offers insightful criticisms of Leibniz’s views and offers his own philosophical contributions is one of the most sophisticated and philosophically interesting texts of the period. And finally, Arnauld was a major player in one of the most important intellectual events of the 17th century, the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic that resulted in many works from both parties. There is much of interest in Arnauld that scholars are just beginning to investigate. While at least one major barrier to Arnauld’s acquiring more attention in the English-speaking world is the lack of English translation of many of his major texts, Arnauld scholarship will no doubt continue to become more prominent and Arnauld will finally receive the attention deserved of one of his influence and acumen.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Primary Texts
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (1775) Oeuvres de Messire Antoine Arnauld, 43 vols., Paris: Sigismond D’Arnay, (abbreviated OA).
    • A collection of Arnauld’s works in their original language (Latin and French).
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (1975) and Claude Lancelot, The Port Royal Grammar, Jacques Rieux and Bernard E. Rollin, trans., Paris: Mouton, (abbreviated PRG).
    • English translation of the Port-Royal Grammar.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (1990) “New Objections to Descartes’ Meditations and Descartes’ Replies”, Elmar Kremer, trans, Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press, (abbreviated as NO).
    • English translation of the letters exchanged by Descartes and Arnauld in 1648.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (1990b) On True and False Ideas, Elmar Kremer, trans., Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press, (abbreviated as K)
    • English translation of On True and False Ideas.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (1996) and Pierre Nicole, Logic or the Art of Thinking, Jill Vance Buroker, trans., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, (abbreviated as B).
    • English translation of the Port-Royal Logic.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (1999) Examen du Traité de l’Essence du corps contre Descartes, Libraire Arthème Fayard, (abbreviated E).
    • A recent edition of the Examen. This edition is French (as was the original). No English translations of this work are available.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (2001) Textes philosophiques, Denis Moreau, trans., Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, (abbreviated as TP).
    • Collection of some of Arnauld’s works including: Philosophical Conclusions (in the original Latin with French translation, no English translation available); excerpt of Quod est nomen Dei (in original Latin with French translation, no English translation available); Dissertation en Deux Parties (French translation from the Latin, Latin not included, no English translation available); and Règles du Bon Sens (French, no English translation available).
  • Descartes, Rene, (1974-1989) Oeuvres de Descartes, 11 vols., Charles Adam and Pual Tannery, eds., Paris: Vrin, (abbreviated as AT)
    • Descartes’ collected works in their original language (French and Latin).
  • Descartes, Rene, (1984-1985) The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 2 vols., John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugland Murdoch, trans., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, (abbreviated as CSM I, and CSM II).
    • Two-volume collection, with standard English translation of many of Descartes’ works.
  • Descartes, Rene, (1991) The Philosophical Writings of Descartes: Volume III, John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugland Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny trans, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, (abbreviated as CSMK III).
    • Third volume and companion to CSM I and II. This volume is a collection of many of Descartes’ letters.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried, (1875-1890) Die Philosophischen Schriften von G. W. Leibniz, ed. C.I. Gerhardt, 7 vols (Berlin, Weidman), (abbreviated as G).
    • A collection of Leibniz’s complete works in their original language (Latin, French and German).
  • Leibniz, Gottfried, (1967) The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence, trans. H. T. Mason, (Manchester: Manchester University Press). (abbreviated as M)
    • English translation of the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried, (1980) Discourse on Metaphysics/Correspondence with Arnauld/Monadology, trans. George Montgomery, La Salle: The Open Court Publishing Company, (abbreviated as D).
    • English translation of Leibniz’s Discourse on Metaphysics, Monadology and the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence. More readily available than the Mason translation.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried, (1989) Philosophical Essays, eds. and trans. Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber, Indianapolis: Hackett, (abbreviated as AG).
    • One volume collection of many of Leibniz’s most important works in English.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas, (1958-1967) Oeuvres Complètes de Malebranche, Directeur A. Robinet, 20 volumes (Paris: J. Vrin), abbreviated OC. Citation as follows: (OC, volume, page).
    • Malebranche’s collected works in their original language (French).
  • Malebranche, Nicolas, (1992) Philosophical Selections, ed. Nadler, Indianapolis: Hackett, (abbreviated as PS).
    • Collection of Malebranche selections in English.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas, (1992) Treatise on Nature and Grace, trans. Patrick Riley, Oxford: Clarendon Press, (abbreviated as R).
    • English translation of Malebranche’s Treatise on Nature and Grace.
  • Voltaire, (1906) Siècle de Louis XIV (Paris: Hachette)
    • Voltaire’s history of the Age of Louis XIV.
  • Primary Source Abbreviations
  • Antoine Arnauld
  • B         (1996) and Pierre Nicole, Logic or the Art of Thinking, Jill Vance Buroker, trans., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • E          (1999) Examen du Traité de l’Essence du corps contre Descartes, Libraire Arthème Fayard.
  • K         (1990b) On True and False Ideas, Elmar Kremer, trans., Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press.
  • NO      (1990) “New Objections to Descartes’ Meditations and Descartes’ Replies”, Elmar Kremer, trans, Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press.
  • OA      (1775-1783) Oeuvres de Messire Antoine Arnauld, 43 vols., Paris: Sigismond D’Arnay.
  • PRG    (1975) and Claude Lancelot, The Port Royal Grammar, Jacques Rieux and Bernard E. Rollin, trans., Paris: Mouton.
  • TP        (2001) Textes philosophiques, Denis Moreau, trans., Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Rene Descartes
  • AT       (1974-1989) Oeuvres de Descartes, 11 vols., Charles Adam and Paul Tannery, eds., Paris: Vrin.
  • CSM I (1984-1985) The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 2 vols., John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugland Murdoch, trans., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • CSMK III (1991) The Philosophical Writings of Descartes: Volume III, John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugland Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny trans, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gottfried Leibniz
  • AG      (1989) Philosophical Essays, eds. and trans. Roger Areiw and Dnaiel Garber, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • D         (1980) Discourse on Metaphysics/Correspondence with Arnauld/Monadology, George Montgomery trans, La Salle: The Open Court Publishing Company.
  • G         (1875-1890) Die Philosophiscehm Schriften von G. W. Leibniz, ed. C.I. Gerhardt, 7 vols (Berlin, Weidman).
  • M         (1967) The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence, trans. H. T. Mason, Manchester: Manchester University Press.
  • Nicolas Malebranche
  • OC      (1958-1967) Oeuvres Complètes de Malebranche, Directeur A. Robinet, 20 volumes (Paris: J. Vrin).
  • PS        (1992) Philosophical Selections, ed. Nadler, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • R         (1992) Treatise on Nature and Grace, trans. Patrick Riley, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Secondary Works
  • Article Collections on Arnauld in English:
  • The Great Arnauld and Some of His Philosophical Correspondents ed. Elmar Kremer (Toronto: Toronto University Press, 1990).
    • Contains two papers on Arnauld’s logic and scientific method authored by Jill Vance Buroker and Fred Wilson respectively, five papers on Arnauld and Malebranche on ideas by Monte Cook, Elmar Kremer, Steven Nadler, Richard Watson and Norman Wells respectively, two papers on the Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence, by Graeme Hunter and Jean-Claude Pariente respectively and one paper on Arnauld’s account of grace and free will, by Kremer.
  • Interpreting Arnauld, ed. Elmar Kremer (Toronto: Toronto University Press, 1996).
    • Collection of papers on Arnauld including papers by Jill Vance Buroker, Alan Nelson, Peter Schouls, Thomas Lennon, Aloyse-Raymond Ndiaye, Elmar Kremer, Vincent Carraud, Graeme Hunter, Jean-Luc Solère, Steven Nadler, and Robert C. Sleigh, some of which will be highlighted in the bibliography below.
  • Books/Articles:
  • Black, Andrew, (1997) “Malebranche’s Theodicy”, Journal of the History of Philosophy 35, pp. 27-44.
    • Discussion of Malebranche’s theodicy, containing a defense of the ‘general content’ reading of the particular-general volitions distinction in Malebranche.
  • Buroker, Jill Vance, (1996) “Introduction” in Antoine Arnauld and Pierre Nicole, Logic or the Art of Thinking, Jill Vance Buroker, trans., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. ix-xxvi.
    • Helpful introduction to the Logic.
  • Carraud, Vincent, (1995) “Arnauld: From Ockhamism to Cartesianism” Descartes and His Contemporaries, in Ariew and Grene, ed., Descartes and His Contemporaries, pp. 110-128.
    • An examination of Arnauld’s early philosophy (pre-Fourth Objections) arguing that Arnauld’s early philosophy is in many respects Ockhamist.
  • Carraud, Vincent, (1996) “Arnauld: A Cartesian Theologian? Omnipotence, Freedom of Indifference, and the Creation of the Eternal Truths”, in Kremer, ed., Interpreting Arnauld, pp. 91-110.
    • A discussion of whether Arnauld held the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths.
  • Curley, E.M., (1984) “Descartes on the Creation of the Eternal Truths”, The Philosophical Review 93,  pp. 569-597.
    • Paper focusing on Descartes and the eternal truths. Standard defense of the iterated modality reading.
  • Faye, Emmanuel, (2005) “The Cartesianism of Desgabets and Arnauld and the Problem of the Eternal Truths”, Garber, Daniel and Steven Nadler, eds., Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy vol. 2 (Oxford: Clarendon Press), pp. 191-209.
    • Discussion of the Cartesianism of Arnauld (especially on the Creation of the Eternal Truths) and Robert Desgabets.
  • Frankfurt, Harry, (1977) “Descartes on the Creation of the Eternal Truths”, The Philosophical Review 86, pp. 36-57.
    • Paper focusing on Descartes and the eternal truths. Standard defense of the contingency reading.
  • Gouhier, Henri, (1978) Cartesianisme et augustinisme au XVII siècle, Paris: J Vrin.
    • Book-length study of Augustinianism and Cartesianism in the 17th century with discussion of many figures from the period including two chapters largely on Arnauld. In French.
  • Grene, Marjorie, (1998) Descartes, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company.
    • Book on Descartes’ general philosophy with a chapter on ‘The Port Royal Connection’ with much discussion of Arnauld.
  • Jacques, Emile, (1976) Les anées d’exil d’Antoine Arnauld (1679-1694) (Louvain: Publications Universitaires de Louvain and Editions Nauwelaerts).
    • Historical study of Arnauld especially from 1679-1694. In French.
  • Kaufman, Dan, (2002) “Descartes’s Creation Doctrine and Modality”, Australasion Journal of Philosophy 80, pp. 24-41.
    • Paper focusing on Descartes and the eternal truths. Defends the claim that Descartes held both the God freely created the eternal truths and that they are necessarily true.
  • Kremer, Elmar J., (1990) “Introduction”, On True and False Ideas, Elmar Kremer, trans., (Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press), pp. xi-xxxiv.
    • Helpful introduction to On True and False Ideas including a discussion of the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic.
  • Kremer, Elmar J., (1994) “Grace and Free Will in Arnauld”, in The Great Arnauld and Some of His Philosophical Correspondents, pp. 219-239.
    • A discussion of grace and freewill in Arnauld arguing for a change in his view around 1684.
  • Kremer, Elmar J., (1996) “Arnauld’s Interpretation of Descartes as a Christian Philosopher”, in Interpreting Arnauld, pp. 76-90.
    • A discussion of several issues in which Kremer argues Arnauld departs from Descartes including on the nature of matter, the relation between mind and body and the eternal truths.
  • Lennon, Thomas M., (1977) “Jansenism and the Crise Pyrrhonienne”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 38, pp. 297-306.
    • Discussion of the relationship between Jansenism and skepticism, arguing that skepticism was characteristic of Jansenism.
  • Miel, Jan, (1969) “Pascal, Port-Royal, and Cartesian Linguistics”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 30, pp. 261-271.
    • Article questioning the extent to which the Port-Royal Logic and the Port-Royal Grammar are ‘Cartesian’.
  • Moreau, Denis, (1999) Deux Cartesiens: La Polemique Arnauld Malebranche, Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
    • Book-length study of the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic. No English translation is available. There is an English version of a paper summarizing some of the key aspects of the debate by the same author. See, Moreau (2000).
  • Moreau, Denis, (2000) “The Malebranche-Arnauld Debate”, in ed. Nadler, The Cambridge Companion to Malebranche, pp. 87-111.
    • Article-length summary of some of the main components of the Arnauld-Malebranche polemic. Including a helpful chronology of the writtings in the debate.
  • Nadler, Steven, (1988) “Arnauld, Descartes, and Transubstantiation: Reconciling Cartesian Metaphysics and Real Presence”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 49, pp. 229-246.
    • Examination of the role that the problem of transubstantiation played in Arnauld’s philosophy (both his ultimate endorsement of Cartesianism and his defense ofCartesianism).
  • Nadler, Steven, (1988b) “Cartesianism and the Port Royal”, Monist, 71, pp. 573-584.
    • Study of the relation between the Port Royal and Cartesianism especially focusing on three figures: Louis-Paul Du Vaucel, Le Maistre de Sacy and Pierre Nicole.
  • Nadler, Steven, (1989) Arnauld and the Cartesian Philosophy of Ideas, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • Book-length discussion of Arnauld's theory of ideas, especially in terms of the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic.
  • Nadler, Steven, (1992) Malebranche and Ideas (New York: Oxford University Press)
    • Book-length study of Malebranche’s theory of ideas.
  • Nadler, Steven, (1995) “Occasionalism and the Question of Arnauld’s Cartesianism”, in Ariew and Grene, ed., Descartes and His Contemporaries, pp. 129-144.
    • Paper arguing that Arnauld was a mind-body occasionalist.
  • Nadler, Steven, (1996) “’Tange montes et fumigabunt’: Arnauld on the Theodicies of Malebranche and Leibniz”, in Kremer, ed. Interpreting Arnauld, pp. 147-163.
    • An examination of Arnauld’s criticisms of the theodicies of Leibniz and Malebranche arguing that from Arnauld’s perspective, despite their differences both suffer the same problems.
  • Nadler, Steven, ed., (2000b) The Cambridge Companion to Malebranche, New York: Cambridge University Press.
    • Collection of papers on Malebranche including papers on the Malebranche-Arnauld Debate, Malebranche’s Theodicy and Vision in God.
  • Nadler, Steven, (2008) “Arnauld’s God” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 46 (2008), pp. 517-538.
    • Paper-length treatment of Arnauld’s conception of God arguing that Arnauld had a thoroughly voluntarist conception of God.
  • Nadler, Steven, (2008b) The Best of All Possible Worlds, Farrar, Straus and Giroux: New York.
    • Book-length (and especially accessible) discussion of the theodicies and interactions of Leibniz, Arnauld and Malebranche.
  • Ndiaye, Aloyse-Raymond, (1991) La Philosophie D’Antoine Arnauld, Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
    • Book-length general study of Arnauld’s philosophy. In French.
  • Ndiaye, Aloyse-Raymond, (1996) “The Status of the Eternal Truths in the Philosophy of Antoine Arnauld”, in Kremer, ed. Interpreting Arnauld, pp. 64-75.
    • Paper-length argument that Arnauld (at least early in his career) did not endorse the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths.
  • Nelson, Alan, (1993) "Cartesian Actualism in the Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence", Canadian Journal of Philosophy 23, pp. 675-94.
    • Paper arguing that Arnauld endorsed an actualist theory of possibility in the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence.
  • Parkinson, G. H. R., (1967) “Introduction”, in The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence, trans. H. T. Mason, (Manchester: Manchester University Press).
    • Relatively brief (about 50 pages) summary and analysis of the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence.
  • Pessin, Andrew, (2001) “Malebranche’s Distinction Between General and Particular Volitions”, Journal of the History of Philosophy 39, pp. 77-99.
    • Defense of the ‘particular content’ interpretation of Malebranche’s distinction between general and particular volitions.
  • Robinet, Andre, (1991) Preface, in Ndiaye (1991), Prais: J Vrin.
    • Brief preface to Ndiaye's Antoine Arnauld.
  • Rozemond, Marleen, (1998) Descartes’s Dualism, Cambridge Mass.: Harvard University Press.
    • Book-length study of Descartes’ dualism including discussion of the Real Distinction argument and the mind-body union.
  • Rutherford, Donald, (2000) “Malebranche’s Theodicy”, in Steven Nadler ed., The Cambridge Companion to Malebranche (New York: Cambridge University Press), pp. 165-189.
    • Excellent overview of Malebranche’s theodicy.
  • Schmaltz, Tad, (1996) Malebranche’s Theory of the Soul, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Book-length treatment of Malebranche’s theory of the soul and its relation to his Cartesianism. Includes many discussions of Arnauld and his interactions with Malebranche.
  • Schmaltz, Tad, (1999) “What Has Cartesianism to Do with Jansenism?”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 60, pp. 37-56.
    • This paper explores the relationship between Cartesianism and Jansenism. This paper discusses both their theoretical relation as well as their historical relation in 17th century France.
  • Schmaltz, Tad, (2002) Radical Cartesianism, New York: Cambridge University Press.
    • Book-length investigation of the philosophy of two Seventeenth Century Cartesians: Robert Desgabets and Pierre-Sylvain Regis, with substantive discussions of Arnauld throughout.
  • Sedgwick, Alexander, (1977) Jansenism in Seventeenth-Century France, Charlottesville: University Press of Virginia.
    • Book-length study of Jansenism in 17th century France.
  • Sedgwick, Alexander, (1998) The Travails of Conscience, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
    • Book-length historical study of the Arnauld family.
  • Sleigh, Robert C, (1990) Leibniz and Arnauld: A Commentary on Their Correspondence, New Haven: Yale University Press.
    • A book-length treatment of the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence including a chapter devoted to Arnauld, and chapters focusing on the exchange between Leibniz and Arnauld on substance, freedom and action,
  • Stencil, Eric, (2011) “Malebranche and the General Will of God”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy 19 (6), pp. 1107-1129.
    • Discussion of Malebranche’s conception of the general/particular volition distinction and argument focusing on Malebranche’s theodicy that Arnauld misunderstood the distinction.
  • Van Cleve, James, (1983) “Conceivability and the Cartesian Argument for Dualism”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 64, pp. 35-45.
    • Paper focusing on Descartes’ argument for mind-body substance dualism.
  • Watson, Richard A., (1987) The Breakdown of Cartesian Metaphysics, Atlantic Heights: Humanities Press.
    • Book-length discussion of the “downfall” (both historically and philosophically) of Cartesian Metaphysics covering many debates about Cartesianism after Descartes including discussions of Simon Foucher, Louis de La Forge and Arnauld.
  • Wilson, Margaret, (1978) Descartes (London and New York: Routledge).
    • Book-length general (and very influential) study of Descartes’ philosophy.
  • Yablo, Stephen, (1993) “Is Conceivability a Guide to Possibility?”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 53, pp. 1-42.
    • An examination of several objections to the claim that conceivability is a guide to possibility


Author Information

Eric Stencil
Utah Valley University
U. S. A.

Feng Youlan (Fung Yu-lan, 1895—1990)

Feng Youlan (romanized as Fung Yu-lan) was a representative of modern Chinese philosophy. Throughout his long and turbulent life, he consistently engaged the problem of reconciling traditional Chinese thought with the methods and concerns of modern Western philosophy. Raised by a modernist family who nonetheless gave him a traditional Confucian education, Feng pursued two great goals during his career: rewriting the history of Chinese philosophy from a modern perspective, and developing a reconstructed version of Chinese philosophy that could respond to the modern situation. The famous translator of Chinese philosophical texts, Wing-tsit Chan, summed up Feng’s contribution by saying: “At a time when Chinese intellectuals saw little value in the Chinese tradition, Professor Feng upheld it.”

Although Feng published his monumental and still-influential Zhongguo zhexue shi (History of Chinese Philosophy) in 1934, his effort to synthesize the traditional Neo-Confucianism of Cheng Hao, Cheng Yi, and Zhu Xi with the philosophical traditions of the modern West that he studied with John Dewey took much longer to complete and arguably was never entirely successful. Between 1939 and 1947, during the early years of China’s occupation by Japan, Feng published Xin lixue (New Teaching of Principle), in which he presented Chinese philosophy, particularly Confucianism, as valuable for addressing both “the True Realm” (corresponding to the transcendent, metaphysical world of what Confucians call li – “principle” or cosmic norms – and ti, “substance”) and “the Real Realm” (corresponding to the immanent, physical world of qi, “energy” or material forms, and yong, “function”). Feng contrasted Daoist philosophy, which he labeled “the philosophy of subtraction” (that is, inward-looking and seeking unity with nature), and both Mohist and Western philosophy, which he described as “the philosophy of augmentation” (that is, outward-looking and seeking to master nature); with Confucian philosophy, which he saw as “the middle way” between so-called “other-worldly” and “this-worldly” philosophies.

Due to political upheaval in China following the defeat of Japan and the successful Communist revolution in the 1940s, Feng proved unable to continue this philosophical project and in many ways reversed direction. Telling Chinese Communist Party chairman Mao Zedong that he was “unwilling to be a remnant of a bygone age in a time of greatness,” Feng devoted himself to reinterpreting both his earlier work and Chinese philosophy in general through the lens of Marxist thought, which had become the orthodox ideology in mainland China under Mao’s rule, even going so far as to denounce Confucius during the final years of the Cultural Revolution (1966-1976). This effort provoked great controversy among his peers, many of whom had fled China to establish “New Confucian” enclaves within the universities of Hong Kong and Taiwan as well as in the West. Partly as a result of his controversial immersion in Maoist politics, Feng’s most enduring contribution to Chinese philosophy probably is his historical account of the subject rather than his own philosophical synthesis. Nonetheless, his work remains an interesting example of the way in which early 20th century Chinese thinkers attempted to develop a rational philosophical system that was credible to both Chinese and Western traditions.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophical Works
    1. A Comparative Study of Life Ideals
    2. Six Books of Zhengyuan
  3. A History of Chinese Philosophy
  4. Influence
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Feng Youlan, whose zi (“style”) or courtesy name was Zhisheng, was born on December 4, 1895, in Tanghe County, Henan Province, to an affluent and prominent family.  Feng’s father completed the highest level of study required by the Qing dynasty imperial civil service and headed the local Confucian academy, but also maintained a personal library that included books about the West and modern affairs. From the age of six, Feng pursued a private education in the Confucian curriculum typical of the time, but had little interest in traditional rote learning. At the age of fifteen, he began studying in the county middle school and one year later transferred to high school, first in the provincial capital of Kaifeng, and then in neighboring Hubei Province. At the age of seventeen, he was admitted to the preparatory class of the Chinese Public University in Shanghai, where all courses were taught with English textbooks and the curriculum included Western logic and philosophy.

Feng studied philosophy at Peking (Beijing) University from 1915 to 1918, during which time he was exposed to various forms of foreign thought, ranging from the philosophy of Henri Bergson to the “New Realism” associated with British philosophers such as W. P. Montague. Also during this time, the New Cultural Movement, which questioned traditional Confucian values, was in full swing, provoking counter-reactions from conservative Confucian scholars. At Peking University, Feng met both Hu Shi (1891-1962), the iconoclast critic of Confucianism and Liang Shuming (1893-1988), the New Confucian apologist and social activist. In 1919, he traveled to the United States and, like Hu Shi before him, studied with John Dewey at Columbia University. He was deeply impressed by the United States’ advanced technology, emphasis on commerce, and atmosphere of law and order, which helped to confirm his sense that the Chinese psyche was inward-looking, contemplative, and holistic, while the Western spirit was outward-looking, analytical, and reductionistic. He was among the first to introduce Liang Shuming’s work to America.

In 1923, Feng completed his Ph.D. at Columbia, having entitled his dissertation A Comparison of Life Ideals. Looking back at this early work some sixty years later, Feng wrote:

I maintained that the difference between cultures is the difference between the East and the West. This was in fact the prevailing opinion at that time.  However, as I further studied the history of philosophy, I found this prevailing opinion to be incorrect. I discovered that what is considered to be the philosophy of the East has existed in the history of the philosophy of the West as well, and vice versa. I discovered that mankind has the same essential nature and the same problems of life... (Feng 2008: 658)

After completing his doctoral studies at Columbia, Feng returned to China and began his long teaching career there, having paid close attention to intellectual trends in China while he was abroad. Between 1923 and 1926, Feng held appointments in the philosophy departments of several Chinese universities, culminating in his being named Chair of the Philosophy Department and Dean of College of Humanities at Beijing’s prestigious Tsinghua (Qinghua) University in 1927.

In 1934, Feng had a fateful encounter with Communist ideology that would influence the future course of his life. While en route to a philosophical conference in Prague, he stopped to visit the Soviet Union, where he found a grand social experiment in progress.  Although he was not blind to the imperfections of Soviet Communism, he also was attracted to its utopian possibilities, as he later proclaimed in public speeches. As a result of his visit to the Soviet Union, he was detained briefly by Jiang Jieshi’s (Chiang Kai-shek’s) Nationalist government, but upon his release established a close relationship with the regime, which then ruled China despite the revolutionary activities of Communist factions. The outbreak of war between China and Japan in 1937 inspired Feng to work for the patriotic recognition and preservation of China’s unique philosophical heritage.  Between 1937 and 1946, he published a series of books to help justify Jiang Jieshi’s New Life Movement, which sought to safeguard the prosperity of the nation by instilling traditional values into Chinese citizens’ daily lives and transforming their moral character.

Due to political upheaval in China following the defeat of Japan in 1945 and the successful Communist revolution in 1949, Feng proved unable to continue this philosophical project and in many ways reversed direction. Telling Chinese Communist Party chairman Mao Zedong that he was “unwilling to be a remnant of a bygone age in a time of greatness,” Feng renounced his association with the Nationalist regime and devoted himself to reinterpreting both his earlier work and Chinese philosophy in general through the lens of Marxist thought, which had become the orthodox ideology in mainland China under Mao’s rule. This new work provoked great controversy among his peers, many of whom had fled China to establish “New Confucian” enclaves within the universities of Hong Kong and Taiwan as well as in the West.

Despite his apparent conversion to doctrinaire Marxism, Feng attempted to preserve a place for Confucianism under Mao’s aegis, asserting that this and other Chinese philosophical traditions, despite their reactionary historical baggage, could be “conceptually and abstractly” relevant in the Communist era. For example, Feng argued that the Confucian concept of ren or “benevolence” had in the past served the purpose of making the oppressed and exploited masses lose sight of intense class struggle and had sedated them into believing a dream of an impossible classless and harmonious society. Feng believed, however, that if taken “abstractly,” ren for all people could be a helpful idea even in Mao’s “New China.”

During China’s Cultural Revolution (1966-1976) Feng, along with many other academics, was denounced by Mao. Near the end of this period, however, Feng was able to regain a measure of public influence by allying himself with Mao’s wife, Jiang Qing, who enlisted his aid in her propaganda campaign against Confucius between 1973 and 1976. After Mao’s death and Jiang’s arrest and imprisonment, Feng’s political decisions cost him both his mianzi (“face” or public reputation) and, for a short time, his freedom.  By the 1980s, Feng was able to return to teaching and began work on a new manuscript entitled A New History of Chinese Philosophy, which was incomplete when he died in 1990.

2. Philosophical Works

a. A Comparative Study of Life Ideals

In 1923, Feng wrote his doctoral thesis A Comparative Study of Life Ideals. As the title of his thesis suggests, the relationship between Chinese and Western cultures was the focal point of his philosophical thinking. According to Feng, all forms of philosophy fall into three categories: “the philosophy of subtraction,” “the philosophy of augmentation,” and “the middle way.” Philosophers who value the natural world and distain human interference with nature wish to return to a state of innocence by reducing human artifice and interference. In this camp Feng placed Laozi and Zhuangzi, both of whom advocated “abandoning humanity and righteousness” and “eliminating sagehood and wisdom.” On the other hand, Feng saw both Western thought and Mozi’s philosophy as encouraging the conquest and transformation of nature and thus belonging to “the philosophy of augmentation.” Finally, Confucianism as Feng sees it insists on cultivating a balanced relationship between humans and nature and is therefore the middle way.

b. Six Books of Zhengyuan

The so-called Six Books of Zhengyuan include A New Philosophy of Principle, New Discourses on Events, New Social Admonitions, A New Inquiry into Man, A New Inquiry into the Tao, and A New Understanding of Language. Here, Feng’s approach was strongly constructive, as he intended to carry forward the Chinese philosophical tradition through these publications. Inspired by Neo-Confucian thinkers such as Cheng Yi, and Zhu Xi, Feng called his philosophy the “New Philosophy of Principle” (Xin lixue).

In order to understand Feng’s reinterpretation of Neo-Confucian thought, it is necessary to examine the Neo-Confucian concepts of li (“principle” or “cosmic pattern”) and qi (“energy” or “material force”). Feng understood these paired concepts as representing the ontological relationship between the universal and the particular. The universal is eternal, abstract and intangible, yet it has a certain material basis in the concrete world or the world of “instruments,” as the Yijing (Book of Changes) describes it: “That which is above physical form is the Dao (“Way”); those things contained by physical form are instruments.” Objects in the concrete world that have physical form are not the proper objects of philosophical thinking. Rather, philosophy is concerned with knowing the universal through logical analysis. Feng distinguished between the metaphysical world of li (which he called “the True Realm”) and and ti (“substance”) and the physical world of qi (“the Real Realm”) and yong (“function”). The True Realm is like an arcane book, such that those with untrained eyes see only blank pages, but philosophical minds see meaningful words engraved on them. Between the two, the True Realm is “first,” not temporally but ontologically. That is, a given class of things in the Real Realm is an imperfect revelation of certain principle in the True Realm. Feng’s reimagined Confucian ethics, in shaping human society, is functionally derived from Principle of the True Realm.

Feng’s “New Philosophy of Principle” is realist in outlook – that is, it assumes that moral truths exist as facts, and thus that ethics and ontology are interrelated. As facts, moral truths really exist, and possess an inherent but abstract existence as “principle” (li). This “principle” manifests itself concretely as “material force” (qi) in the ever-flowing phenomenal world of the Way (Dao). Like Neo-Confucian thinkers long before him, Feng adapted Chinese Buddhism’s notion of “the emptiness of emptiness” to develop his notion of the Great Whole (daquan), or the totality of all that exists. Within the Great Whole, all things are one, and human beings find their purpose. The self-definition of human beings inevitably comes from their understanding of the universe.

All of this is very much in keeping with traditional Chinese thought’s concern for the harmonious relationship between Heaven, nature and human beings. Feng’s comparative studies of Plato and Zhu Xi, on the one hand, and of Immanuel Kant and the Daoists, on the other hand, represent a revamped lixue based on the fundamental outline of Zhu Xi’s highly influential philosophical synthesis, which (unlike the efforts of most of Feng’s fellow “New Confucians”), bid fair to become a major contribution to world philosophy.  Unfortunately, Feng proved unable to revise, refine, or elaborate upon this groundbreaking work of the 1930s.

3. A History of Chinese Philosophy

Feng began work on A History of Chinese Philosophy during the 1920s. Prior to its publication in 1934, the only available modern critical history of Chinese philosophy was Hu Shi’s Outlines of the History of Chinese Philosophy (1919), which was the first attempt to break away from traditional genres of writing about the history of Chinese philosophy. The latter are often based on unexamined genealogical traditions and historically unreliable materials. In addition, the traditional writings are typically in the form of commentaries and even random notes and reflections on classical texts, and lack a systematic approach. Hu attempted to address these two issues by offering critical scholarship analyzing and authenticating historical documents, on the one hand, and providing a survey of Chinese thought by means of employing Western philosophical concepts, on the other hand. The problem with Hu’s work was that he never finished it. Feng decided to follow in Hu’s footsteps and compose a comprehensive and critical historical account of Chinese philosophy, using the scholarly tools he had mastered at Columbia University. In contrast with Hu’s effort to dismantle and debunk Chinese traditions, however, Feng claimed that his approach more accurately and honestly interpreted the various schools and thinkers of Chinese philosophical traditions. Having based his own philosophy on Confucian concepts, Feng insisted on the central role of Confucianism in Chinese intellectual history.

Feng self-consciously adopted a modern approach to Chinese philosophy. He abandoned the traditional view that all historical Chinese thought was an imperfect interpretation of perfect truths revealed by ancient sages. However, unlike Hu Shi and other iconoclastic scholars of the time, Feng refused to see history as pious fabrications concocted by the political and religious powers of old. His method was to interpret and appreciate tradition as a valuable historical legacy. For instance, against traditional commentators, Feng insisted that the Laozi (also known as the Daodejing) was written at a time much later than the Spring and Autumn Period (770-481 B.C.E.)—a view since borne out by archaeological discoveries, although the date of the text remains a contested issue among scholars. But this does not make the Laozi a worthless forgery, as the iconoclasts contended. Feng was also extremely keen on creating a comprehensive understanding of the entire history of Chinese philosophy. Feng’s intention was to give his readers a sense of the direction and development in Chinese philosophy. He wanted to show that there were periods when Chinese thought was original and creative (such as in the era prior to the Qin dynasty’s establishment in 221 B.C.E.), followed by other periods when it became rigid and stagnant (as in the late feudal society of the 18th and 19th centuries). He also stressed that true philosophy came from observing nature and social life, not from lofty theories and hair-splitting textual analysis.

Many scholars see Feng’s historiographical contributions to Chinese philosophy as much more significant than his original constructive contributions as a Chinese philosopher.  Prior to the publication of A History of Chinese Philosophy, Chinese thinkers did not group their traditional schools of thought with “philosophy” as understood in the West.  It was not until the very late 19th century, in fact, that a word for “philosophy” appeared in East Asian languages. The Japanese thinker Nishi Amane (1829-1897) coined the term tetsugaku, “the study of wisdom,” to approximate the Western concept of “philosophy,” and this term was adopted for use in Chinese by the scholar-official Huang Zunxian (1848-1905) as zhexue, which typically was reserved for the description of Western thought, excluding traditional Chinese thought. Although this exclusive and Eurocentric view of philosophy still has its adherents, Feng’s achievement was in defining Chinese thought and Western thought in terms of the common category of zhexue or “philosophy.”

A History of Chinese Philosophy appeared in several different translations, first in Derk Bodde’s English edition and later in several other languages, including Japanese, French, Italian, Korean, and German. During Feng’s 1948 visit to the University of Pennsylvania, he gave lectures that later became the basis of the English-language book, A Short History of Chinese Philosophy (1948). In the 1980s, Feng began – but never completed – a revised, Marxist version of A History of Chinese Philosophy, which was to be called A New History of Chinese Philosophy.

4. Influence

Views of Feng’s philosophical legacy vary according to cultural context. In China, Feng is considered to be one of the few original philosophers that twentieth-century China produced. Not remembered for his classroom eloquence by his former students, Feng Youlan nevertheless was able to impart his scholarship on, and passion for, Chinese philosophy to generations of students, many of whom currently hold teaching positions in elite Chinese universities.

As a result of their renewed interest in twentieth-century “New Confucian” thinkers, contemporary Chinese scholars have devoted a considerable amount of scholarship to Feng’s “New Philosophy of Principle” (xin lixue), which they typically regard as a systematic and sophisticated endeavor. For many of his Chinese admirers, Feng’s works are evidence that ancient Chinese (especially Confucian) conceptions can be retooled and made useful for modern times. The influence of Feng’s thought is likely to become greater as Confucian traditions enjoy something of a revival across contemporary China.

In the West, on the other hand, Feng’s influence is limited mainly to the reception of A History of Chinese Philosophy, which has been translated into multiple Western languages. With the exception of a few somewhat obscure publications, there has not been substantial Western scholarly engagement of general philosophical interest with Feng’s works. Often recommended as an indispensable read for students of Chinese culture, history, and thought, A History of Chinese Philosophy also has received criticism for its apparent partiality to Confucianism over Buddhism and Daoism, China’s two other great spiritual and intellectual traditions. Although Feng considered himself to be a philosopher, his reputation outside of China is that of an historian, and the nature of Western academic interest in Feng has focused on him as an historical figure in his own right, who lived during a particularly critical and troubled moment in the development of modern China.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Chen, Derong. Metaphorical Metaphysics in Chinese Philosophy: Illustrated with Feng Youlan’s New Metaphysics. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2011.
  • Chen, Lai. Tradition and Modernity: A Humanist View. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2009.
  • Cheng, Chung-Ying, and Nicholas Bunnin, eds. Contemporary Chinese Philosophy. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers, 2002.
  • de Bary, William Theodore, and others, eds. Sources of Chinese Tradition. 2 vols. New York: Columbia University Press, 1999-2000.
  • Feng, Youlan. Selected Philosophical Writings of Feng Yu-lan. Beijing: Foreign Languages Press, 2008.
  • Feng, Youlan. The Hall of Three Pines: An Account of My Life. Trans. Denis C. Mair. Honolulu: University of Hawai’i Press, 1999.
  • Feng, Youlan. The Spirit of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Ernest Richard Hughes. Boston: Beacon Press, 1962.
  • Feng, Youlan. A History of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1952-53.
  • Feng, Youlan. A Short History of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Derk Bodde. New York: Free Press, 1948.
  • Makeham, John. New Confucianism: A Critical Examination. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2003.
  • Masson, Michel C. Philosophy and Tradition: The Interpretation of China’s Philosophic Past -- Fung Youlan, 1939-1949. Taipei: Ricci Institute, 1985.
  • Obenchain, Diane B., ed. Something Exists: Selected papers of the International Research Seminar on the Thought of Feng Youlan. Honolulu: Dialogue Publishing, 1994.
  • Teoh, Vivienne. The Post ’49 Critiques of Confucius in the PRC, with Special Emphasis on the Views of Feng Youlan and Yang Rongguo: A Case Study of the Relationship between Contemporary Political Values and the Re-evaluation of the History of Chinese Philosophy. Thesis (Ph.D.) -- University of New South Wales, 1982.
  • Wycoff, William Alfred. The New Rationalism of Fung Yu-Lan. Thesis (Ph. D.) --Columbia University, 1975.


Author Information

Xiaofei Tu
Appalachian State University
U. S. A.