Western Theories of Justice

Justice is one of the most important moral and political concepts.  The word comes from the Latin jus, meaning right or law.  The Oxford English Dictionary defines the “just” person as one who typically “does what is morally right” and is disposed to “giving everyone his or her due,” offering the word “fair” as a synonym.  But philosophers want to get beyond etymology and dictionary definitions to consider, for example, the nature of justice as both a moral virtue of character and a desirable quality of political society, as well as how it applies to ethical and social decision-making.  This article will focus on Western philosophical conceptions of justice.  These will be the greatest theories of ancient Greece (those of Plato and Aristotle) and of medieval Christianity (Augustine and Aquinas), two early modern ones (Hobbes and Hume), two from more recent modern times (Kant and Mill), and some contemporary ones (Rawls and several successors).  Typically the article considers not only their theories of justice but also how philosophers apply their own theories to controversial social issues—for example, to civil disobedience, punishment, equal opportunity for women, slavery, war, property rights, and international relations.

For Plato, justice is a virtue establishing rational order, with each part performing its appropriate role and not interfering with the proper functioning of other parts. Aristotle says justice consists in what is lawful and fair, with fairness involving equitable distributions and the correction of what is inequitable.  For Augustine, the cardinal virtue of justice requires that we try to give all people their due; for Aquinas, justice is that rational mean between opposite sorts of injustice, involving proportional distributions and reciprocal transactions.  Hobbes believed justice is an artificial virtue, necessary for civil society, a function of the voluntary agreements of the social contract; for Hume, justice essentially serves public utility by protecting property (broadly understood).  For Kant, it is a virtue whereby we respect others’ freedom, autonomy, and dignity by not interfering with their voluntary actions, so long as those do not violate others’ rights; Mill said justice is a collective name for the most important social utilities, which are conducive to fostering and protecting human liberty.  Rawls analyzed justice in terms of maximum equal liberty regarding basic rights and duties for all members of society, with socio-economic inequalities requiring moral justification in terms of equal opportunity and beneficial results for all; and various post-Rawlsian philosophers develop alternative conceptions.

Western philosophers generally regard justice as the most fundamental of all virtues for ordering interpersonal relations and establishing and maintaining a stable political society.  By tracking the historical interplay of these theories, what will be advocated is a developing understanding of justice in terms of respecting persons as free, rational agents.  One may disagree about the nature, basis, and legitimate application of justice, but this is its core.

Table of Contents

  1. Ancient Greece
    1. Plato
    2. Aristotle
  2. Medieval Christianity
    1. Augustine
    2. Aquinas
  3. Early Modernity
    1. Hobbes
    2. Hume
  4. Recent Modernity
    1. Kant
    2. Mill
  5. Contemporary Philosophers
    1. Rawls
    2. Post-Rawls
  6. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Ancient Greece

For all their originality, even Plato’s and Aristotle’s philosophies did not emerge in a vacuum.  As far back in ancient Greek literature as Homer, the concept of dikaion, used to describe a just person, was important.  From this emerged the general concept of dikaiosune, or justice, as a virtue that might be applied to a political society.  The issue of what does and does not qualify as just could logically lead to controversy regarding the origin of justice, as well as that concerning its essence.  Perhaps an effective aid to appreciating the power of their thought is to view it in the context of the teachings of the Sophists, those itinerant teachers of fifth-century ancient Greece who tried to pass themselves off as “wise” men.  In his trial, Socrates was at pains to dissociate himself from them, after his conviction refusing to save himself, as a typical Sophist would, by employing an act of civil disobedience to escape (Dialogues, pp. 24-26, 52-56; 18b-19d, 50a-54b); Plato is more responsible than anyone else for giving them the bad name that sticks with them to this present time; and Aristotle follows him in having little use for them as instructors of rhetoric, philosophy, values, and the keys to success.  So what did these three great philosophers (literally “lovers of wisdom”) find so ideologically objectionable about the Sophists?  The brief answer is, their relativism and their skepticism.  The first important one, Protagoras, captures the former with his famous saying, “Man is the measure of all things—of the things that are, that they are, and of the things that are not, that they are not”; and he speaks to the latter with a declaration of agnosticism regarding the existence of divinities.  Gorgias (Plato named dialogues after both of them) is remembered for a striking three-part statement of skepticism, holding that nothing really exists, that, even if something did exist, we could not grasp it, and that, even if we could grasp something real, we could never express it to anyone else.  If all values are subjective and/or unknowable, then what counts as just gets reduced to a matter of shifting opinion.  We can easily anticipate how readily Sophists would apply such relativism and skepticism to justice.  For example, Thrasymachus (who figures into the first book of Plato’s Republic) is supposed to have said that there must not be any gods who care about us humans because, while justice is our greatest good, men commonly get away with injustice.  But the most significant Sophist statement regarding justice arguably comes from Antiphon, who employs the characteristic distinction between custom (nomos) and nature (physis) with devastating effect.  He claims that the laws of justice, matters of convention, should be obeyed when other people are observing us and may hold us accountable; but, otherwise, we should follow the demands of nature.  The laws of justice, extrinsically derived, presumably involve serving the good of others, the demands of nature, which are internal, serving self-interest.  He even suggests that obeying the laws of justice often renders us helpless victims of those who do not (First, pp. 211, 232, 274, 264-266).  If there is any such objective value as natural justice, then it is reasonable for us to attempt a rational understanding of it.  On the other hand, if justice is merely a construction of customary agreement, then such a quest is doomed to frustration and failure.  With this as a backdrop, we should be able to see what motivated Plato and Aristotle to seek a strong alternative.

a. Plato

Plato’s masterful Republic (to which we have already referred) is most obviously a careful analysis of justice, although the book is far more wide-ranging than that would suggest.  Socrates, Plato’s teacher and primary spokesman in the dialogue, gets critically involved in a discussion of that very issue with three interlocutors early on.  Socrates provokes Cephalus to say something which he spins into the view that justice simply boils down to always telling the truth and repaying one’s debts.  Socrates easily demolishes this simplistic view with the effective logical technique of a counter-example:  if a friend lends you weapons, when he is sane, but then wants them back to do great harm with them, because he has become insane, surely you should not return them at that time and should even lie to him, if necessary to prevent great harm.  Secondly, Polemarchus, the son of Cephalus, jumps into the discussion, espousing the familiar, traditional view that justice is all about giving people what is their due.  But the problem with this bromide is that of determining who deserves what.  Polemarchus may reflect the cultural influence of the Sophists, in specifying that it depends on whether people are our friends, deserving good from us, or foes, deserving harm.  It takes more effort for Socrates to destroy this conventional theory, but he proceeds in stages:  (1) we are all fallible regarding who are true friends, as opposed to true enemies, so that appearance versus reality makes it difficult to say how we should treat people; (2) it seems at least as significant whether people are good or bad as whether they are our friends or our foes; and (3) it is not at all clear that justice should excuse, let alone require, our deliberately harming anyone (Republic, pp. 5-11; 331b-335e).  If the first inadequate theory of justice was too simplistic, this second one was downright dangerous.

The third, and final, inadequate account presented here is that of the Sophist Thrasymachus.  He roars into the discussion, expressing his contempt for all the poppycock produced thus far and boldly asserting that justice is relative to whatever is advantageous to the stronger people (what we sometimes call the “might makes right” theory).  But who are the “stronger” people?  Thrasymachus cannot mean physically stronger, for then inferior humans would be superior to finer folks like them.  He clarifies his idea that he is referring to politically powerful people in leadership positions.  But, next, even the strongest leaders are sometimes mistaken about what is to their own advantage, raising the question of whether people ought to do what leaders suppose is to their own advantage or only what actually is so.  (Had Thrasymachus phrased this in terms of what serves the interest of society itself, the same appearance versus reality distinction would apply.)  But, beyond this, Socrates rejects the exploitation model of leadership, which sees political superiors as properly exploiting inferiors (Thrasymachus uses the example of a shepherd fattening up and protecting his flock of sheep for his own selfish gain), substituting a service model in its place (his example is of the good medical doctor, who practices his craft primarily for the welfare of patients).  So, now, if anything like this is to be accepted as our model for interpersonal relations, then Thrasymachus embraces the “injustice” of self-interest as better than serving the interests of others in the name of “justice.”  Well, then, how are we to interpret whether the life of justice or that of injustice is better?  Socrates suggests three criteria for judgment:  which is the smarter, which is the more secure, and which is the happier way of life; he argues that the just life is better on all three counts.  Thus, by the end of the first book, it looks as if Socrates has trounced all three of these inadequate views of justice, although he himself claims to be dissatisfied because we have only shown what justice is not, with no persuasive account of its actual nature (ibid., pp. 14-21, 25-31; 338c-345b, 349c-354c).  Likewise, in Gorgias, Plato has Callicles espouse the view that, whatever conventions might seem to dictate, natural justice dictates that superior people should rule over and derive greater benefits than inferior people, that society artificially levels people because of a bias in favor of equality.  Socrates is then made to criticize this theory by analyzing what sort of superiority would be relevant and then arguing that Callicles is erroneously advocating injustice, a false value, rather than the genuine one of true justice (Gorgias, pp. 52-66; 482d-493c; see, also, Laws, pp. 100-101, 172; 663, 714 for another articulation of something like Thrasymachus’ position).

In the second book of Plato’s Republic, his brothers, Glaucon and Adeimantus, take over the role of primary interlocutors.  They quickly make it clear that they are not satisfied with Socrates’ defense of justice.  Glaucon reminds us that there are three different sorts of goods—intrinsic ones, such as joy, merely instrumental ones, such as money-making, and ones that are both instrumentally and intrinsically valuable, such as health—in order to ask which type of good is justice.  Socrates responds that justice belongs in the third category, rendering it the richest sort of good.  In that case, Glaucon protests, Socrates has failed to prove his point.  If his debate with Thrasymachus accomplished anything at all, it nevertheless did not establish any intrinsic value in justice.  So Glaucon will play devil’s advocate and resurrect the Sophist position, in order to challenge Socrates to refute it in its strongest form.  He proposes to do this in three steps:  first, he will argue that justice is merely a conventional compromise (between harming others with impunity and being their helpless victims), agreed to by people for their own selfish good and socially enforced (this is a crude version of what will later become the social contract theory of justice in Hobbes); second, he illustrates our allegedly natural selfish preference for being unjust if we can get away with it by the haunting story of the ring of Gyges, which provides its wearer with the power to become invisible at will and, thus, to get away with the most wicked of injustices—to which temptation everyone would, sooner or later, rationally succumb; and, third, he tries to show that it is better to live unjustly than justly if one can by contrasting the unjust person whom everyone thinks just with the just person who is thought to be unjust, claiming that, of course, it would be better to be the former than the latter.  Almost as soon as Glaucon finishes, his brother Adeimantus jumps in to add two more points to the case against justice:  first, parents instruct their children to behave justly not because it is good in itself but merely because it tends to pay off for them; and, secondly, religious teachings are ineffective in encouraging us to avoid injustice because the gods will punish it and to pursue justice because the gods will reward it, since the gods may not even exist or, if they do, they may well not care about us or, if they are concerned about human behavior, they can be flattered with prayers and bribed with sacrifices to let us get away with wrongdoing (Republic, pp. 33-42; 357b-366e).  So the challenge for Socrates posed by Plato’s brothers is to show the true nature of justice and that it is intrinsically valuable rather than only desirable for its contingent consequences.

In defending justice against this Sophist critique, Plato has Socrates construct his own positive theory.  This is set up by means of an analogy comparing justice, on the large scale, as it applies to society, and on a smaller scale, as it applies to an individual soul.  Thus justice is seen as an essential virtue of both a good political state and a good personal character.  The strategy hinges on the idea that the state is like the individual writ large—each comprising three main parts such that it is crucial how they are interrelated—and that analyzing justice on the large scale will facilitate our doing so on the smaller one.  In Book IV, after cobbling together his blueprint of the ideal republic, Socrates asks Glaucon where justice is to be found, but they agree they will have to search for it together.  They agree that, if they have succeeded in establishing the foundations of a “completely good” society, it would have to comprise four pivotal virtues:  wisdom, courage, temperance, and justice.  If they can properly identify the other three of those four, whatever remains that is essential to a completely good society must be justice.  Wisdom is held to be prudent judgment among leaders; courage is the quality in defenders or protectors whereby they remain steadfast in their convictions and commitments in the face of fear; and temperance (or moderation) is the virtue to be found in all three classes of citizens, but especially in the producers, allowing them all to agree harmoniously that the leaders should lead and everyone else follow.  So now, by this process-of-elimination analysis, whatever is left that is essential to a “completely good” society will allegedly be justice.  It then turns out that “justice is doing one’s own work and not meddling with what isn’t one’s own.”  So the positive side of socio-political justice is each person doing the tasks assigned to him or her; the negative side is not interfering with others doing their appointed tasks.  Now we move from this macro-level of political society to the psychological micro-level of an individual soul, pressing the analogy mentioned above.  Plato has Socrates present an argument designed to show that reason in the soul, corresponding to the leaders or “guardians” of the state, is different from both the appetites, corresponding to the productive class, and the spirited part of the soul, corresponding to the state’s defenders or “auxiliaries” and that the appetites are different from spirit.  Having established the parallel between the three classes of the state and the three parts of the soul, the analogy suggests that a “completely good” soul would also have to have the same four pivotal virtues.  A good soul is wise, in having good judgment whereby reason rules; it is courageous in that its spirited part is ready, willing, and able to fight for its convictions in the face of fear; and it is temperate or moderate, harmoniously integrated because all of its parts, especially its dangerous appetitive desires, agree that it should be always under the command of reason.  And, again, what is left that is essential is justice, whereby each part of the soul does the work intended by nature, none of them interfering with the functioning of any other parts.  We are also told in passing that, corresponding to these four pivotal virtues of the moral life, there are four pivotal vices, foolishness, cowardice, self-indulgence, and injustice.  One crucial question remains unanswered:  can we show that justice, thus understood, is better than injustice in itself and not merely for its likely consequences?  The answer is that, of course, we can because justice is the health of the soul.  Just as health is intrinsically and not just instrumentally good, so is justice; injustice is a disease—bad and to be avoided even if it isn’t yet having any undesirable consequences, even if nobody is aware of it (ibid., pp. 43, 102-121; 368d, 427d-445b; it can readily be inferred that this conception of justice is non-egalitarian; but, to see this point made explicitly, see Laws, pp. 229-230; 756-757).

Now let us quickly see how Plato applies this theory of justice to a particular social issue, before briefly considering the theory critically.  In a remarkably progressive passage in Book V of his Republic, Plato argues for equal opportunity for women.  He holds that, even though women tend to be physically weaker than men, this should not prove an insuperable barrier to their being educated for the same socio-political functions as men, including those of the top echelons of leadership responsibility.  While the body has a gender, it is the soul that is virtuous or vicious.  Despite their different roles in procreation, child-bearing, giving birth, and nursing babies, there is no reason, in principle, why a woman should not be as intelligent and virtuous—including as just—as men, if properly trained.  As much as possible, men and women should share the workload in common (Republic, pp. 125-131; 451d-457d).  We should note, however, that the rationale is the common good of the community rather than any appeal to what we might consider women’s rights.  Nevertheless, many of us today are sympathetic to this application of justice in support of a view that would not become popular for another two millennia.

What of Plato’s theory of justice itself?  The negative part of it—his critique of inadequate views of justice—is a masterful series of arguments against attempts to reduce justice to a couple of simplistic rules (Cephalus), to treating people merely in accord with how we feel about them (Polemarchus), and to the power-politics mentality of exploiting them for our own selfish purposes (Thrasymachus).  All of these views of a just person or society introduce the sort of relativism and/or subjectivism we have identified with the Sophists.  Thus, in refuting them, Plato, in effect, is refuting the Sophists.  However, after the big buildup, the positive part—what he himself maintains justice is—turns out to be a letdown.  His conception of justice reduces it to order.  While some objective sense of order is relevant to justice, this does not adequately capture the idea of respecting all persons, individually and collectively, as free rational agents.  The analogy between the state and the soul is far too fragile to support the claim that they must agree in each having three “parts.”  The process-of-elimination approach to determining the nature of justice only works if those four virtues exhaust the list of what is essential here.  But do they?  What, for example, of the Christian virtue of love or the secular virtue of benevolence?  Finally, the argument from analogy, showing that justice must be intrinsically, and not merely instrumentally, valuable (because it is like the combination good of health) proves, on critical consideration, to fail.  Plato’s theory is far more impressive than the impressionistic view of the Sophists; and it would prove extremely influential in advocating justice as an objective, disinterested value.  Nevertheless, one cannot help hoping that a more cogent theory might yet be developed.

b. Aristotle

After working with Plato at his Academy for a couple of decades, Aristotle was understandably most influenced by his teacher, also adopting, for example, a virtue theory of ethics.  Yet part of Aristotle’s greatness stems from his capacity for critical appropriation, and he became arguably Plato’s most able critic as well as his most famous follower in wanting to develop a credible alternative to Sophism.  Book V of his great Nicomachean Ethics deals in considerable depth with the moral and political virtue of justice.  It begins vacuously enough with the circular claim that it is the condition that renders us just agents inclined to desire and practice justice.  But his analysis soon becomes more illuminating when he specifies it in terms of what is lawful and fair.  What is in accordance with the law of a state is thought to be conducive to the common good and/or to that of its rulers.  In general, citizens should obey such law in order to be just.  The problem is that civil law can itself be unjust in the sense of being unfair to some, so that we need to consider special justice as a function of fairness.  He analyzes this into two sorts:  distributive justice involves dividing benefits and burdens fairly among members of a community, while corrective justice requires us, in some circumstances, to try to restore a fair balance in interpersonal relations where it has been lost.  If a member of a community has been unfairly benefited or burdened with more or less than is deserved in the way of social distributions, then corrective justice can be required, as, for example, by a court of law.  Notice that Aristotle is no more an egalitarian than Plato was—while a sort of social reciprocity may be needed, it must be of a proportional sort rather than equal.  Like all moral virtues, for Aristotle, justice is a rational mean between bad extremes.  Proportional equality or equity involves the “intermediate” position between someone’s unfairly getting “less” than is deserved and unfairly getting “more” at another’s expense.  The “mean” of justice lies between the vices of getting too much and getting too little, relative to what one deserves, these being two opposite types of injustice, one of “disproportionate excess,” the other of disproportionate “deficiency” (Nicomachean, pp. 67-74, 76; 1129a-1132b, 1134a).

Political justice, of both the lawful and the fair sort, is held to apply only to those who are citizens of a political community (a polis) by virtue of being “free and either proportionately or numerically equal,” those whose interpersonal relations are governed by the rule of law, for law is a prerequisite of political justice and injustice.  But, since individuals tend to be selfishly biased, the law should be a product of reason rather than of particular rulers.  Aristotle is prepared to distinguish between what is naturally just and unjust, on the one hand, such as whom one may legitimately kill, and what is merely conventionally just or unjust, on the other, such as a particular system of taxation for some particular society.  But the Sophists are wrong to suggest that all political justice is the artificial result of legal convention and to discount all universal natural justice (ibid., pp. 77-78; 1134a-1135a; cf. Rhetoric, pp. 105-106; 1374a-b).  What is allegedly at stake here is our developing a moral virtue that is essential to the well-being of society, as well as to the flourishing of any human being.  Another valuable dimension of Aristotle’s discussion here is his treatment of the relationship between justice and decency, for sometimes following the letter of the law would violate fairness or reasonable equity.  A decent person might selfishly benefit from being a stickler regarding following the law exactly but decide to take less or give more for the sake of the common good.  In this way, decency can correct the limitations of the law and represents a higher form of justice (Nicomachean, pp. 83-84; 1137a-1138a).

In his Politics, Aristotle further considers political justice and its relation to equality.  We can admit that the former involves the latter but must carefully specify by maintaining that justice involves equality “not for everyone, only for equals.”  He agrees with Plato that political democracy is intrinsically unjust because, by its very nature, it tries to treat unequals as if they were equals.  Justice rather requires inequality for people who are unequal.  But, then, oligarchy is also intrinsically unjust insofar as it involves treating equals as unequal because of some contingent disparity, of birth, wealth, etc.  Rather, those in a just political society who contribute the most to the common good will receive a larger share, because they thus exhibit more political virtue, than those who are inferior in that respect; it would be simply wrong, from the perspective of political justice, for them to receive equal shares.  Thus political justice must be viewed as a function of the common good of a community.  It is the attempt to specify the equality or inequality among people, he admits, that constitutes a key “problem” of “political philosophy.”  He thinks we can all readily agree that political justice requires “proportional” rather than numerical equality.  But inferiors have a vested interest in thinking that those who are equal in some respect should be equal in all respects, while superiors are biased, in the opposite direction, to imagine that those who are unequal in some way should be unequal in all ways.  Thus, for instance, those who are equally citizens are not necessarily equal in political virtue, and those who are financially richer are not necessarily morally or mentally superior.  What is relevant here is “equality according to merit,” though Aristotle cannot precisely specify what, exactly, counts as merit, for how much it must count, who is to measure it, and by what standard.  All he can suggest, for example in some of his comments on the desirable aristocratic government, is that it must involve moral and intellectual virtue (Politics, pp. 79, 81, 86, 134, 136, 151, 153; 1280a, 1281a, 1282b, 1301a-1302a, 1307a, 1308a).

Let us now consider how Aristotle applies his own theory of justice to the social problem of alleged superiors and inferiors, before attempting a brief critique of that theory.  While Plato accepted slavery as a legitimate social institution but argued for equal opportunity for women, in his Politics, Aristotle accepts sexual inequality while actively defending slavery.  Anyone who is inferior intellectually and morally is properly socio-politically inferior in a well-ordered polis.  A human being can be naturally autonomous or not, “a natural slave” being defective in rationality and morality, and thus naturally fit to belong to a superior; such a human can rightly be regarded as “a piece of property,” or another person’s “tool for action.”  Given natural human inequality, it is allegedly inappropriate that all should rule or share in ruling.  Aristotle holds that some are marked as superior and fit to rule from birth, while others are inferior and marked from birth to be ruled by others.  This supposedly applies not only to ethnic groups, but also to the genders, and he unequivocally asserts that males are “naturally superior” and females “naturally inferior,” the former being fit to rule and the latter to be ruled.  The claim is that it is naturally better for women themselves that they be ruled by men, as it is better for “natural slaves” that they should be ruled by those who are “naturally free.”  Now Aristotle does argue only for natural slavery.  It was the custom (notice the distinction, used here, between custom and nature) in antiquity to make slaves of conquered enemies who become prisoners of war.  But Aristotle (like Plato) believes that Greeks are born for free and rational self-rule, unlike non-Greeks (“barbarians”), who are naturally inferior and incapable of it.  So the fact that a human being is defeated or captured is no assurance that he is fit for slavery, as an unjust war may have been imposed on a nobler society by a more primitive one.  While granting that Greeks and non-Greeks, as well as men and women, are all truly human, Aristotle justifies the alleged inequality among them based on what he calls the “deliberative” capacity of their rational souls.  The natural slave’s rational soul supposedly lacks this, a woman has it but it lacks the authority for her to be autonomous, a (free male) child has it in some developmental stage, and a naturally superior free male has it developed and available for governance (ibid., pp. 7-11, 23; 1254a-1255a, 1260a).

This application creates a helpful path to a critique of Aristotle’s theory of justice.  If we feel that it is unjust to discriminate against people merely on account of their gender and/or ethnic origin, as philosophers, we try to identify the rational root of the problem.  If our moral intuitions are correct against Aristotle (and some would even call his views here sexist and racist), he may be mistaken about a matter of fact or about a value judgment or both.  Surely he is wrong about all women and non-Greeks, as such, being essentially inferior to Greek males in relevant ways, for cultural history has demonstrated that, when given opportunities, women and non-Greeks have shown themselves to be significantly equal.  But it appears that Aristotle may also have been wrong in leaping from the factual claim of inequality to the value judgment that it is therefore right that inferiors ought to be socially, legally, politically, and economically subordinate—like Plato and others of his culture (for which he is an apologist here), Aristotle seems to have no conception of human rights as such.  Like Plato, he is arguing for an objective theory of personal and social justice as a preferable alternative to the relativistic one of the Sophists.  Even though there is something attractive about Aristotle’s empirical (as opposed to Plato’s idealistic) approach to justice, it condemns him to the dubious position of needing to derive claims about how things ought to be from factual claims about the way things actually are.  It also leaves Aristotle with little viable means of establishing a universal perspective that will respect the equal dignity of all humans, as such.  Thus his theory, like Plato’s, fails adequately to respect all persons as free, rational agents.  They were so focused on the ways in which people are unequal, that they could not appreciate any fundamental moral equality that might provide a platform for natural human rights.

2. Medieval Christianity

When Christian thinkers sought to develop their own philosophies in the middle ages (“medieval” meaning the middle ages and “middle” in the sense of being between antiquity and modernity), they found precious basic building-blocks in ancient thought.  This included such important post-Aristotelians as the enormously influential Roman eclectic Cicero, such prominent Stoics as Marcus Aurelius (a Roman emperor) and Epictetus (a Greek slave of the Romans), and neo-Platonists like Plotinus.  But the two dominant paths that medieval philosophy would follow for its roughly thousand year history had been blazed by Plato and Aristotle.  More specifically, Augustine uses Platonic (and neo-Platonic) philosophy to the extent that he can reconcile it with Christian thought; Aquinas, many centuries later, develops a great synthesis of Christian thought (including that of Augustine) and Aristotelian philosophy.  A great difference, however, between their philosophies and those of Hellenic thinkers such as Plato and Aristotle stems from the commitment of these Christians to the authority of the Hebrew and Christian scriptures.  Aquinas would later agree with Augustine (who is accepting the mandate of Isaiah 7:9) that the quest for philosophical understanding should begin with belief in religious traditions (Choice, pp. 3, 32).  Both the Old Testament and the New Testament call for just behavior on the part of righteous people, with injustice being a sin against God’s law, the references being too numerous to cite (but see Job 9:2, Proverbs 4:18, Proverbs 10:6-7, Ecclesiastes 7:20, Matthew 5:45, Philippians 4:8, and Hebrews 12:23).  The claim that God’s justice will prevail in the form of divine judgment is both a promise for the just and a threat for the unjust.  Righteousness is identified with mercy as well as with justice (e.g., Micah 6:8 and Matthew 5:7) and involves our relationship with God as well as with fellow humans.  The ten commandments of the Old Testament (Exodus 20:1-17) are prescriptions regarding how the righteous are to relate to God as well as to one another.  In the New Testament, Jesus of Nazareth interprets how the righteous are to live (Matthew 22:36-40) in terms of love of both God and their neighbors; the concept of one’s neighbor is meant to extend even to strangers, as is illustrated in the parable of the Good Samaritan (Luke 10:29-37).  In the Beatitudes beginning the Sermon on the Mount, Jesus expands on this gospel of love by advocating that his followers go beyond the duties of justice to behave with compassion in certain supererogatory ways (Matthew 5:3-12).  All of this scriptural tradition essentially influenced medieval thinkers such as Augustine and Aquinas in a way that distinguishes them from ancient Greek philosophers such as Plato and Aristotle.

a. Augustine

Aurelius Augustine was born and raised in the Roman province of North Africa; during his life, he experienced the injustices, the corruption, and the erosion of the Roman Empire.  This personal experience, in dialectical tension with the ideals of Christianity, provided him with a dramatic backdrop for his religious axiology.  Philosophically, he was greatly influenced by such neo-Platonists as Plotinus.  His Christian Platonism is evident in his philosophical dialogue On Free Choice of the Will, in which he embraces Plato’s view of four central moral virtues (which came to be called “cardinal,” from the Latin word for hinges, these being metaphorically imaginable as the four hinges on which the door of morality pivots).  These are prudence (substituted for wisdom), fortitude or courage, temperance, and justice.  His conception of justice is the familiar one of “the virtue by which all people are given their due.”  But this is connected to something new and distinctly Christian—the distinction between the temporal law, such as the law of the state, and the eternal, divine law of God.  The eternal law establishes the order of God’s divine providence.  And, since all temporal or human law must be consistent with God’s eternal law, Augustine can draw the striking conclusion that, strictly speaking, “an unjust law is no law at all,” an oxymoron (Choice, pp. 20, 11, 8; cf. Religion, p. 89, for an analysis of justice that relates it to love).  Thus a civil law of the state that violates God’s eternal law is not morally binding and can be legitimately disobeyed in good conscience.  This was to have a profound and ongoing influence on Christian ethics.

In his masterpiece, The City of God, Augustine draws the dramatic conclusion from this position that the Roman Empire was never a truly just political society.  He expresses his disgust over its long history of “revolting injustice.”  Rome was always a pagan, earthly city, and “true justice” can allegedly only be found in a Christian “city of God.”  The just, rather than the powerful, should rule for the common good, rather than serving their own self-interest.  He strikingly compares unjust societies, based on might rather than on right, to “gangs of criminals on a large scale,” for, without justice, a kingdom or empire is merely ruled by the arbitrary fiat of some leader(s).  A genuinely just society must be based on Christian love, its peaceful order established by the following of two basic rules—that people harm nobody and that they should try to help everyone to the extent that they can do so (City, pp. 75, 67, 75, 138-139, 873).

Despite his Christian commitment to love and peace, Augustine is not a pacifist and can support “just wars” as morally permissible and even as morally obligatory.  Every war aims at the order of some sort of established peace; while an unjust war aims to establish an unjust peace of domination, a just war aims to establish a “just peace.”  He agrees with Cicero that a just war must be defensive rather than aggressive (ibid., pp. 861-862, 866, 868-869, 1031).  In a letter (# 138) to Marcellinus, Augustine uses scripture to deny that Christian doctrine is committed to pacifism, though wars should be waged, when necessary, with a benevolent love for the enemy.  In a letter (# 189) to Boniface, he maintains that godly, righteous people can serve in the military, again citing scripture to support his position.  He repeats the view that a just war should aim at establishing a lasting and just peace and holds that one must keep faith with both one’s allies and one’s enemies, even in the awful heat of warfare.  Augustine’s most important treatment of the just war theory is contained in his writing Against Faustus the Manichean, where he analyzes the evils of war in terms of the desire to harm others, the lust for revenge and cruelty, and the wish to dominate other people.  In addition to the condition that a just war must aim at establishing a just and lasting peace, a second condition is that it must be declared by a leader or body of leaders, with the “authority” to do so, after deliberating that it is justified.  Again Augustine makes it clear that he is no pacifist (Political, pp. 209, 219-223).

While this is a very valuable application of his theory of justice, this doctrine of the just war standing the test of time to this very day, the general theory on which it is based is more problematic.  The unoriginal (and uninspired) conception of justice as giving others their due had already become familiar to the point of being trite.  It remains vulnerable to the serious problems of vagueness already considered:  what is the relevant criterion whereby it should be determined who deserves what, and who is fit to make such a judgment?  But, also, Augustine should have an advantage over the ancient Greeks in arriving at a theory of justice based on universal equality on account of the Christian doctrine (not to mention because of the influences of Cicero, the Stoics, and Plotinus) that all humans are equally children of God.  Unfortunately, his zealous Christian evangelism leads him to identify justice itself, in a divisive, intolerant, polemical way, with the Christian church’s idea of what God requires, so that only a Christian society can possibly qualify as just, as if a just political society would need to be a theocracy.  Thus, while he has some sense of some moral or spiritual equality among humans, it does not issue in equal respect for all persons as free, rational agents, allowing him, for example, to accept the institution of slavery as a just punishment for sin, despite the belief that God originally created humans as naturally free, because of the idea that we have all been corrupted by original sin (City, pp. 874-875).

b. Aquinas

As Augustine is arguably the greatest Christian Platonist, so Thomas Aquinas, from what is now Italy, is the greatest Christian Aristotelian.  Nevertheless, as we shall see, his theory of justice is also quite compatible with Augustine’s.  Aquinas discusses the same four cardinal moral virtues, including that of justice, in his masterpiece, the multi-volume Summa Theologica.  No more a socio-political egalitarian than Plato, Aristotle, or Augustine, he analyzes it as calling for proportional equality, or equity, rather than any sort of strict numerical equality, and as a function of natural right rather than of positive law.  Natural right ultimately stems from the eternal, immutable will of God, who created the world and governs it with divine providence.  Natural justice must always take precedence over the contingent agreements of our human conventions.  Human law must never contravene natural law, which is reason’s way of understanding God’s eternal law.  He offers us an Aristotelian definition, maintaining that “justice is a habit whereby a man renders to each one his due by a constant and perpetual will.”  As a follower of Aristotle, he defines concepts in terms of genus and species.  In this case, the general category to which justice belongs is that it is a moral habit of a virtuous character.  What specifically distinguishes it from other moral virtues is that by justice, a person is consistently committed to respecting the rights of others over time.  Strictly speaking, the virtue of justice always concerns interpersonal relations, so that it is only metaphorically that we can speak of a person being just to himself.  In addition to legal justice, whereby a person is committed to serving the “common good” of the entire community, there is “particular justice,” which requires that we treat individuals in certain ways.  Justice is a rational mean between the vicious extremes of deficiency and excess, having to do with our external actions regarding others.  Like many of his predecessors, Aquinas considers justice to be preeminent among the moral virtues.  He agrees with Aristotle in analyzing particular justice into two types, which he calls “distributive” and “commutative”; the former governs the proportional distribution of common goods, while the latter concerns the reciprocal dealings between individuals in their voluntary transactions (Law, pp. 137, 139, 145, 147, 155, 160, 163, 165).

Aquinas applies this theory of justice to many social problems.  He maintains that natural law gives us the right to own private property.  Given this natural right, theft (surreptitiously stealing another’s property) and robbery (taking it openly by force or the threat of violence) must be unjust, although an exception can arise if the thief and his family are starving in an environment of plenty, in which case, stealing is justified and, strictly speaking, not theft or robbery at all.  Secondly, Aquinas refines the Augustinian just war theory by articulating three conditions that must jointly be met in order for the waging of war to be just:  (a) it must be declared by a leader with socio-political authority; (b) it must be declared for a “just cause,” in that the people attacked must be at fault and thus deserve it; and (c) those going to war must intend good and the avoidance of evil.  It is not justifiable deliberately to slay innocent noncombatants.  It is legitimate to kill another in self-defense, though one’s intention should be that of saving oneself, the taking of the other’s life merely being the necessary means to that good end (this, by the way, is the source of what later evolves into the moral principle of “double effect”).  Even acting in self-defense must be done in reasonable proportion to the situation, so that it is wrong to employ more force than is necessary to stop aggression.  Even killing another unintentionally can be unjust if done in the course of committing another crime or through criminal negligence.  Thirdly, while Aquinas thinks we should tolerate the religious beliefs of those who have never been Christians, so that it would be unjust to persecute them, he thinks it just to use force against heretics who adhered to but then rejected orthodox Christianity, even to the point of hurting them, as in the Inquisition, for the good of their own souls.  In an extreme case of recalcitrant heretics who will not be persuaded to return to the truth of Christianity, it is allegedly just that they should be “exterminated” by execution rather than being allowed to corrupt other Christians by espousing their heterodox religious views.  Fourth, like Augustine, Aquinas accepts slavery, so long as no Christian is the slave of a non-Christian (ibid., pp. 178-183, 186, 221, 224, 226, 228, 250, 256, 253), and considers it just that women should be politically and economically “subject” to men.  Although he considers women to be fully human, he agrees with Aristotle that they are “defective and misbegotten,” the consequence allegedly being inferior rational discretion (Summa, pp. 466-467).

From a critical perspective, his general theory of justice is, by now, quite familiar, a sort of blend of Aristotle’s and Augustine’s, and marked by the same flaws as theirs.  His applications of the theory can be regarded as indicative of its problematic character:  (a) given the assumption of a right to own private property, his discussion of the injustices of theft and robbery seems quite reasonable; (b) assuming that we have a right to self-defense, his analysis of the legitimacy of killing in a just war does also; (c) his attempted defense of the persecution of religious heretics, even unto death, invites suspicions of dogmatic, intolerant fanaticism on his part; and (d) his acceptance of slavery and the political and economic subjection of women as just is indicative of an empirical orientation that is too uncritically accepting of the status quo.  Here again the Christian belief that all humans are personal creatures of a loving God is vitiated by an insufficient commitment to the implications of that, regarding socio-political equality, so that only some humans are fully respected as free, rational agents.  The rationalistic theories of Plato and Augustine and the classical empirical theories of Aristotle and Aquinas all leave us hoping that preferable alternatives might be forthcoming.

3. Early Modernity

Although only half as much time elapses between Aquinas and Hobbes as did between Augustine and Aquinas, from the perspective of intellectual history, the period of modernism represents a staggering sea-change.  We have neither the time nor the space to consider the complex causal nexus that explains this fact; but, for our purposes, suffice it to say that the Protestant Reformation, the revolution of the new science, and the progressive willingness publicly to challenge authority (both political and religious) converge to generate a strikingly different philosophical mentality in the seventeenth century.  In the previous century, the Protestant Reformation shattered the hegemony of the Roman Catholic Church, so that thinkers need not feel so constrained to adhere to established orthodoxy.  The naturalistic worldview of the sixteenth and early seventeenth centuries that eventuated in an empirical and experimental (non-dogmatic) methodology in both natural and political science set an example for philosophers.  Thinkers of the modern era became increasingly comfortable breaking from the mainstream to pursue their own independent reasoning.  Although the influence of great ancient philosophers like Plato and Aristotle and of great medieval thinkers such as Augustine and Aquinas would persist, there was no returning to their bygone perspectives.  This vitally affects moral and political theory, in general, and views on justice, in particular.  As we shall see in this section, views of justice as relative to human needs and interests became prominent as they had not been for a couple of millennia.  This will locate Hobbes and Hume closer to the Sophists than had been fashionable since pre-Socratic times in philosophy, regarding justice as a social construct.

a. Hobbes

Whereas Plato, Aristotle, Augustine, and Aquinas all offer accounts of justice that represent alternatives to Sophism, Thomas Hobbes, the English radical empiricist, can be seen as resurrecting the Sophist view that we can have no objective knowledge of it as a moral or political absolute value.  His radical empiricism does not allow him to claim to know anything not grounded in concrete sense experience.  This leads him in Leviathan, his masterpiece, to conclude that anything real must be material or corporeal in nature, that body is the one and only sort of reality; this is the philosophical position of materialistic monism, which rules out the possibility of any spiritual substance.  On this view, “a man is a living body,” only different in kind from other animals, but with no purely spiritual soul separating him from the beasts.  Like other animals, man is driven by instinct and appetite, his reason being a capacity of his brain for calculating means to desirable ends.  Another controversial claim here is that all actions, including all human actions, are causally determined to occur as they do by the complex of their antecedent conditions; this is causal determinism.  What we consider voluntary actions are simply those we perform in which the will plays a significant causal role, human freedom amounting to nothing more exalted than the absence of external restraints.  Like other animals, we are always fundamentally motivated by a survival instinct and ultimately driven by self-interest in all of our voluntary actions; this is psychological egoism.  It is controversial whether he also holds that self-interest should always be our fundamental motivation, which is ethical egoism.  In his most famous Chapter XIII, Hobbes paints a dramatic and disturbing portrait of what human life would be like in a state of nature—that is, beyond the conventional order of civil society.  We would be rationally distrustful of one another, inclined to be anti-social, viewing others as threats to our own satisfaction and well-being.  Interpersonal antagonism would be natural; and, since there would exist no moral distinctions between right and wrong, just and unjust, violent force and fraudulent deception would be desirable virtues rather than objectionable vices.  In short, this would be a state of “war of every man against every man,” a condition in which we could not reasonably expect to survive for long or to enjoy any quality of life for as long as we did.  We are smart enough to realize that this would be a condition in which, as Hobbes famously writes, “the life of man” would inevitably be “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short.”  Fortunately, our natural passions of fear, desire, and hope motivate us to use reason to calculate how we might escape this hellish state.  Reason discovers a couple of basic laws of nature, indicating how we should prudently behave if we are to have any reasonable opportunity to survive, let alone to thrive.  The first of these is double-sided:  the positive side holds that we should try to establish peace with others, for our own selfish good, if we can; the negative side holds that, if we cannot do that, then we should do whatever it takes to destroy whoever might be a threat to our interests.  The second law of nature maintains that, in order to achieve peace with others, we must be willing to give up our right to harm them, so long as they agree to reciprocate by renouncing their right to harm us.  This “mutual transferring of right,” established by reciprocal agreement, is the so-called social contract that constitutes the basis of civil society; and the agreement can be made either explicitly or implicitly (Leviathan, pp. 261-262, 459-460, 79, 136, 82, 95, 74-78, 80-82; for comparable material, see Elements, pp. 78-84, 103-114, as well as Citizen, pp. 109-119, 123-124).

What is conspicuously missing here is any sense of natural justice or injustice.  In the state of nature, all moral values are strictly relative to our desires:  whatever seems likely to satisfy our desires appears “good” to us, and whatever seems likely to frustrate our desires we regard as “evil.”  It’s all relative to what we imaginatively associate with our own appetites and aversions.  But as we move from this state of nature to the state of civil society by means of the social contract, we create the rules of justice by means of the agreements we strike with one another.  Prior to the conventions of the contract, we were morally free to try to do whatever we wished.  But when a covenant is made, then to break it is unjust; and the definition of injustice is no other than the not performance of covenant.  What is not unjust, is just in civil society.  This turns out to be the third law of nature, that, in the name of justice, we must try to keep our agreements.  In civil society, we may justly do anything we have not, at least implicitly, committed ourselves not to do.  A just person typically does just actions, though committing one or a few unjust actions does not automatically render that person unjust, especially if the unjust behavior stems from an error or sudden passion; on the other hand, a person who is typically inclined to commit unjust actions is a guilty person.  Still, if we are as selfishly motivated by our own desires as Hobbes maintains, why should we not break our word and voluntarily commit injustice, if doing so is likely to pay off for us and we imagine we might get away with it (remember the problem posed by Glaucon with the story of the ring of Gyges)?  Clearly one more element is needed to prevent the quick disintegration of the rules of justice so artificially constructed by interpersonal agreement.  This is the power of sovereign authority.  We need laws codifying the rules of justice; and they must be so vigilantly and relentlessly enforced by absolute political power that nobody in his right mind would dare to try to violate them.  People simply cannot be trusted to honor their social commitments without being forced to do so, since “covenants without the sword are but words, and of no strength to secure a man at all.”  In other words, we must sacrifice a great deal of our natural liberty to achieve the sort of security without which life is hardly worth living.  In civil society, our freedom is relative to the lack of specified obligations, what Hobbes calls “the silence of the law.”  If we worry that this invests too much power in the government, which may abuse that power and excessively trample on our freedom, the (cynical) response is that this is preferable to the chaos of the state of nature or to the horrors of civil war (Leviathan, pp. 28-29, 89, 93, 106, 109, 143, 117; for comparable material, see Elements, pp. 88-89, Citizen, pp. 136-140, and Common, p. 34).  One of the most crucial problems of political philosophy is where to strike the balance between personal liberty and public order; Hobbes is, perhaps, more willing than most of us to give up a great deal of the former in order to secure the latter.

As we have with earlier thinkers, let us see how Hobbes applies this theory of justice, as a prelude to evaluating it critically.  He compares the laws of civil society to “artificial chains” binding us to obey the sovereign authority of the state in the name of justice.  The third law of nature, the law of justice, obliges us to obey the “positive” laws of the state.  Any deliberate violation of civil law is a “crime.”  Now the social problem to be considered is that of criminal punishment.  This deliberately inflicts some sort of “evil” on an alleged criminal for violating civil law.  Its rationale is to enforce obedience to the law itself and, thus, to promote security and public order.  Hobbes lays down various conditions that must be met in order for such an infliction of evil to qualify as legitimate “punishment,” including that no retroactive punishment is justifiable.  He also analyzes five sorts of criminal punishment—“corporal, or pecuniary, or ignominy, or imprisonment, or exile,” allowing for a combination of them; he also specifies that the corporal sort can be capital punishment.  It would be wrong for the state deliberately to punish a member of civil society believed to be innocent; indeed, strictly speaking, it would not even qualify as “punishment,” as it fails to meet an essential part of the definition.  The severity of punishment should be relative to the severity of the crime involved, since its rationale is to deter future violations of civil law (Leviathan, pp. 138, 173, 175, 185, 190, 203-208, 230; see, also, Elements, pp. 177-182, and Citizen, pp. 271-279; near the end of his verse autobiography—Elements, p. 264—Hobbes writes, “Justice I Teach, and Justice Reverence”).

While this is a decent consequentialist theory of crime and punishment, the more general view of justice from which it is derived is far more problematic.  It does stand in sharp contrast to the theories of Plato, Aristotle, Augustine, and Aquinas.  It does revive something like the Sophist theory to which they were all advocating alternatives.  And it does reflect the naturalistic approach represented by the new science.  However, all the foundational elements supporting it are quite dubious:  the radical empiricism, the materialism, the determinism, the egoism, the moral relativism, and the narrow conception of human reason.  Without these props, this theory of justice as artificially constructed by us and purely a function of our interpersonal agreements seems entirely arbitrary.  But in addition to its being insufficiently justified, this theory of justice would justify too much.  For example, what would prevent its involving a justification of slavery, if the alternative for the slaves were death as enemies in a state of nature?  Even apart from the issue of slavery, in the absence of any substantive human rights, minorities in civil society might be denied any set of civil liberties, such as the right to adopt religious practices to which they feel called in conscience.  Hobbes’s conception of justice is reductionistic, reducing it to conventional agreements that seem skewed to sacrifice too much liberty on the altar of law and order.

b. Hume

As a transition between Hobbes and Hume, brief mention can be made of John Locke, the most important political philosopher between them.  (The reason he is not being considered at length here is that he does not offer a distinctive general theory of justice.)  In his masterful Second Treatise of Government, Locke describes a state of nature governed by God’s law but insecure in that there is no mechanism for enforcing it, when the natural rights of property—comprising one’s life, liberty, and estates—are violated.  In order to protect such property rights, people agree to a social contract that moves them from that state of nature to a state of political society, with government established to enforce the law.  Another great social contract theorist between Hobbes and Hume who is worth mentioning here (again he gives us no distinctive theory of justice) is Jean-Jacques Rousseau.  In The Social Contract, he maintains that, in a well-ordered society, the general will (rather than the will of any individual or group of individuals) must prevail.  True freedom in society requires following the general will, and those who do not choose to do so can legitimately be forced to do so.  A human being is allegedly so transformed by the move from the state of nature to that of civil society as to become capable of such genuine freedom as will allow each citizen to consent to all the laws out of deference to the common good.   David Hume, an eighteenth-century Scottish thinker, who is very influenced by Locke’s focus on property while rejecting the social contract theory of Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau, is an interesting philosopher to consider in relation to Hobbes.  Like Hobbes, Hume is a radical empiricist and a determinist who is skeptical of justice as an objective, absolute virtue.  But Hume does not explicitly embrace materialism, is not a psychological or ethical egoist, and famously attacks the social contract theory’s account of moral and political obligation on both historical grounds (there is no evidence for it, and history shows that force rather than consent has been the basis of government) and philosophical grounds (even if our ancestors had given their consent, that would not be binding on us, and utility is a more plausible explanation of submission than genuine agreement) alike (Essays, pp. 186-201).  In the third section of his Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, Hume argues that “public utility is the sole origin of justice.”  To place that claim in context, we can note that, like Hobbes, Hume sees all values, including that of justice, as derived from our passions rather than (as Plato, Aristotle, Augustine, and Aquinas thought) from reason.  Any virtue, he maintains, is desirable in that it provides us with the pleasant feeling of approval; and any vice, including that of injustice, is undesirable in that it provides us with the painful sense of disapproval.  In order to qualify as a virtue, a quality must be “useful or agreeable to the person himself or to others.”  It is possible for some virtues to be rich enough to fit appropriately in more than one of these four categories (for example, benevolence seems to be useful and agreeable to both the benevolent person and to others); but justice is purportedly a virtue only because it is useful to others, as members of society.  Hume offers us a unique and fascinating argument to prove his point.  He imagines four hypothetical scenarios, in which either human nature would be radically different (utterly altruistic or brutally selfish) or our environment would be so (with everything we desire constantly and abundantly available or so destitute that hardly anyone could survive), allegedly showing that, in each of them, justice would not be a virtue at all.  His conclusion is that justice is only a virtue because, relative to reality, which is intermediate among these extremes, it is beneficial to us as members of society.  He also refuses to identify justice with “perfect equality,” maintaining that the ideal of egalitarianism is both “impracticable” and “extremely pernicious to human society.”  For Hume, the rules of justice essentially involve protecting private property, although property rights are not absolute and may be abridged in extreme cases where “public safety” and the common good require it.  Even international relations normally require that “rules of justice” be observed for mutual advantage, although public utility can also require that they should be suspended (Enquiry, pp. 20, 85, 72, 21-25, 28-35; see also Essays, pp. 20, 202).  Though different from Hobbes’s theory, this one also leans towards the Sophist view of justice as conventional and relative.

In his masterpiece, A Treatise of Human Nature, Hume makes the striking claim, “Reason is, and ought only to be the slave of the passions,” which rules out all forms of ethical rationalism.  He also makes a remarkable distinction between descriptive language regarding what “is, and is not,” on the one hand, and prescriptive language concerning what “ought, or ought not” to be, on the other, challenging the possibility of ever justifying value claims by means of any factual ones, of logically inferring what should be from what is.  The second part of Book 3 of Hume’s Treatise deals extensively with justice.  Here he calls it an “artificial” but “not arbitrary” virtue, in that we construct it as a virtue for our own purposes, relative to our needs and circumstances, as we experience them.  It is valuable as a means to the end of social cooperation, which is mutually “advantageous.”   An especially beneficial, if unnatural, convention is respecting others’ property, which is what the rules of justice essentially require of us.  The psychological grounds of our sense of justice are a combination of “self-interest” and “sympathy” for others.  He holds a very conservative view of property rights, in that, normally, people should be allowed to keep what they already have acquired.  Indeed, justice normally comprises three principles—“of the stability of possession, of its transference by consent, and of the performance of promises.”  He rejects the traditional definition of justice as giving others their due, because it rashly and wrongly assumes that “right and property” have prior objective reality independent of conventions of justice.  Internationally, the rules of justice assume the status of “the law of nations,” obliging civilized governments to respect the ambassadors of other countries, to declare war prior to engaging them in battle, to refrain from using poisonous weapons against them, and so forth.  The rationale for such principles of international justice is that they reduce the horrors of war and facilitate the advantages of peace.  By respecting other societies’ possessions, leaders minimize the likelihood of war; by respecting the transference of possessions by mutual consent, they enhance the possibilities of international trade; and by keeping their promises, they create a climate for peaceful alliances.  A bit later, Hume adopts a position which, in the twentieth century, has been called a “rule utilitarian” view of justice, writing that, though individual acts of justice might be contrary to public utility, they ought to be performed if they are conducive to “a general scheme or system” of conduct that benefits society as a whole (Treatise, pp. 266, 302, 311, 307, 312, 315, 320-321, 323, 337-338, 362-363, 370-371).  Yet the rules of justice that are normally conducive to public utility are never absolute and can be legitimately contravened where following them would seem to do more harm than good to our society.  He applies this view to the issue of civil disobedience, which is normally unjust because it threatens “public utility” but can be justified as a last resort “in extraordinary circumstances” when that same public utility is in jeopardy (Essays, pp. 202-204).  Whether that is or is not the case in specific circumstances becomes a judgment call.

Hume is important here because of a convergence of several factors.  First, like the Sophists and Hobbes, he makes justice a social construct that is relative to human needs and interests.  Second, like Hobbes, he associates it fundamentally with human passions rather than with reason.  Third, the virtue of justice and the rules of justice are essentially connected to the protection of private property.  And, fourth, he considers public utility to be the sole basis of justice.  This theory would prove extremely influential, in that Kant will take issue with it, while utilitarians like Mill will build on its flexibility.  This sort of flexibility is both a strength and a weakness of Hume’s theory of justice.  While it may be attractive to allow for exceptions to the rules, this also creates a kind of instability.  Is justice merely an instrumental good, having no intrinsic value?  If that were the case, then it would make sense to say that the role of reason is simply to calculate the most effective means to our most desirable ends.  But then, assuming that our ends were sufficiently desirable, any means necessary to achieve them would presumably be justifiable—so that, morally and politically, anything goes, in principle, regardless how revolting.  Finally, notice that Hume himself, because of the empirical nature of his practical philosophy, fails to avoid the “is-ought” trap against which he so deftly warned us:  because some end is sufficiently desired, whatever means are necessary, or even most effective, to achieve it ought to be pursued.  Is this the best we can do in our pursuit of an adequate theory of justice?

4. Recent Modernity

Moving from one of the greatest philosophers of the Enlightenment to the other, we shall see that Kant will take more seriously the “is-ought” challenge than Hume himself did.  As justice is both a moral and a political virtue, helping to prescribe both a good character and right conduct, the question of how such obligations arise is crucial.  For Hume, we ought to pursue virtue (including justice) because it (allegedly) is agreeable and/or useful to do so.  But, then, what is the logical link here?  Why should we, morally speaking, act for the sake of agreeableness and utility?  For Kant, the reason we should choose to do what is right has nothing to do with good consequences.  It is merely because it is the right thing to do.  Conceding that prescriptive “ought” claims can never be logically deduced from any set of factually descriptive “is” claims, Kant will forsake the empirical approach to justice (of Hobbes and Hume) in favor of the sort of rationalistic one that will revert to seeing it as an absolute value, not to be compromised, regardless of circumstances and likely consequences.  Then we shall consider the utilitarian response to this, as developed by the philosopher who is, arguably, the greatest consequentialist of modern times, John Stuart Mill, who, as an empiricist, like Hobbes and Hume, will make what is right a function of what is good.

a. Kant

Immanuel Kant, an eighteenth-century German professor from East Prussia, found his rationalistic philosophical convictions profoundly challenged by Hume’s formidable skepticism (as well as being fascinated by the ideas of Rousseau).  Even though he was not convinced by it, Kant was sufficiently disturbed by it that he committed decades to trying to answer it, creating a revolutionary new philosophical system in order to do so.  This system includes, but is far from limited to, a vast, extensive practical philosophy, comprising many books and essays, including a theory of justice.  It is well known that this practical philosophy—including both his ethical theory and socio-political philosophy—is the most renowned example of deontology (from the Greek, meaning the study or science of duty).  Whereas teleological or consequentialist theories (such as those of Hobbes and Hume) see what is right as a function of and relative to good ends, a deontological theory such as Kant’s sees what is right as independent of what we conceive to be good and, thus, as potentially absolute.  Justice categorically requires a respect for the right, regardless of inconvenient or uncomfortable circumstances and regardless of desirable and undesirable consequences.  Because of the “is-ought” problem, the best way to proceed is to avoid the empirical approach that is necessarily committed to trying to derive obligations from alleged facts.

This is precisely Kant’s approach in the foundational book of his system of practical philosophy, his Grounding for the Metaphysics of Morals.  He argues, in its Preface, that, since the moral law “must carry with it absolute necessity” and since empiricism only yields “contingent and uncertain” results, we must proceed by way of “pure practical reason, “ which would be, to the extent possible, “purified of everything empirical,” such as physiological, psychological, and environmental contingencies.  On this view, matters of right will be equally applicable to all persons as potentially autonomous rational agents, regardless of any contingent differences, of gender, racial or ethnic identity, socio-economic class status, and so forth.  If Kant can pull this off, it will take him further in the direction of equality of rights than any previous philosopher considered here.  In order to establish a concept of right that is independent of empirical needs, desires, and interests, Kant argues for a single fundamental principle of all duty, which he calls the “categorical imperative,” because it tells us what, as persons, we ought to do, unconditionally.  It is a test we can use to help us rationally to distinguish between right and wrong; and he offers three different formulations of it which he considers three different ways of saying the same thing:  (a) the first is a formula of universalizability, that we should try to do only what we could reasonably will should become a universal law; (b) the second is a formula of respect for all persons, that we should try always to act in such a way as to respect all persons, ourselves and all others, as intrinsically valuable “ends in themselves” and never treat any persons merely as instrumental means to other ends; and (c) the third is a “principle of autonomy,” that we, as morally autonomous rational agents, should try to act in such a way that we could be reasonably legislating for a (hypothetical) moral republic of all persons.  For the dignity of all persons, rendering them intrinsically valuable and worthy of respect, is a function of their capacity for moral autonomy.  In his Metaphysics of Morals, Kant develops his ethical system, beyond this foundation, into a doctrine of right and a doctrine of virtue.  The former comprises strict duties of justice, while the latter comprises broader duties of merit.  Obviously, it is the former category, duties we owe all other persons, regardless of circumstances and consequences, that concerns us here, justice being a matter of strict right rather than one of meritorious virtue.  At the very end of his Metaphysics of Morals, Kant briefly discusses “divine justice,” whereby God legitimately punishes people for violating their duties (Ethical, pp. 2-3, 30-44, 36, 48, 158-161).

In his Metaphysical Elements of Justice, which constitutes the first part of his Metaphysics of Morals, Kant develops his theory of justice.  (His concept of Rechtslehre—literally, “doctrine of right”—has also been translated as “doctrine of justice” and “doctrine of law.”)  For Kant, justice is inextricably bound up with obligations with which we can rightly be required to comply. To say that we have duties of justice to other persons is to indicate that they have rights, against us, that we should perform those duties—so that duties of justice and rights are correlative.  Three conditions must be met in order that the concept of justice should apply:  (a) we must be dealing with external interpersonal behaviors; (b) it must relate to willed action and not merely to wishes, desires, and needs; and (c) the consequences intended are not morally relevant.  A person is not committing an injustice by considering stealing another’s property or in wanting to do so, but only by voluntarily taking action to appropriate it without permission; and the act is not justified no matter what good consequences may be intended.  According to Kant, there is only one innate human right possessed by all persons; that is the right freely to do what one wills, so long as that is “compatible with the freedom of everyone else in accordance with a universal law.”  Thus one person’s right freely to act cannot extend to infringing on the freedom of others or the violation of their rights.  This leads to Kant’s ultimate universal principle of justice, which is itself a categorical imperative:  “Every action is just [right] that in itself or in its maxim is such that the freedom of the will of each can coexist together with the freedom of everyone in accordance with a universal law.”  Although the use of coercive force against other persons involves an attempt to restrict their freedom, this is not necessarily unjust, if it is used to counteract their unjust abuse of freedom—for example, in self-defense or punishment or even war.  Kant approvingly invokes three ancient rules of justice:  (1) we should be honest in our dealings with others; (2) we should avoid being unjust towards others even if that requires our trying to avoid them altogether; and (3) if we cannot avoid associating with others, we should at least try to respect their rights (Justice, pp. 29, 38, 30-31, 37; see also Lectures, pp. 211-212).

Kant distinguishes between natural or private justice, on the one hand, and civil or public justice, on the other.  He has an intricate theory of property rights, which we can only touch upon here.  We can claim, in the name of justice, to have rights to (a) physical property, such as your car, (b) the performance of a particular deed by another person, such as the auto shop keeping its agreement to try to fix your car, and (c) certain characteristics of interpersonal relationships with those under our authority, such as obedient children and respectful servants.  Someone who steals your car or the auto mechanic who has agreed to fix it and then fails to try to do so is doing you an injustice.  Children, as developing but dependent persons, have a right to support and care from their parents; but, in turn, they owe their parents obedience while under their authority.  Children are not the property of their parents and must never be treated like things or objects; and, when they have become independent of their parents, they owe them nothing more than gratitude.  Similarly, a master must respect a servant as a person.  The servant may be under contract to serve the master, but that contract cannot be permanent or legitimately involve the giving up of the servant’s personhood (in other words, one cannot justifiably enter into slavery).  While the master has authority over the servant, that must never be viewed as ownership or involve abuse.  This all concerns private or natural justice, having to do with the securing of property rights.  Next let us next consider how Kant applies his theory of justice to the problem of crime and punishment, in the area of public or civil justice, involving protective, commutative, and distributive justice, the requirements of which can be legitimately enforced by civil society.  When a person commits a crime, that involves misusing freedom to infringe the freedom of others or to violate their rights.  Thus the criminal forfeits the right to freedom and can become a legitimate prisoner of the state.  Kant considers the rule that criminals should be punished for their crimes to be “a categorical imperative,” a matter of just “retribution” not to be denied or even mitigated for utilitarian reasons.  This extends to the ultimate punishment, the death penalty:  justice requires that murderers, the most heinous criminals, should suffer capital punishment, as no lesser penalty would be just.  A third application to consider here is that of war.  This is in the international part of public justice that Kant calls “the Law of Nations.”  He adopts a non-empirical version of the social contract theory, interpreting it not as a historical fact mysteriously generating obligations but rather as a hypothetical idea of what free and equal moral agents could reasonably agree to in the way of rules of justice.  Unlike Hobbes, he does not see this as a basis for all moral duty.  It does account for the obligation we have to the state and other citizens.  But states have duties to other states, so that there is an international law of nations.  Even though different states, in the absence of international law, are in a natural condition of a state of war, as Hobbes thought, he was wrong to think that, in that state, anything rightly goes and that there is no justice.  War is bad, and we should try to minimize the need for it, although Kant is not a pacifist and can justify it for purposes of self-defense.  Kant proposes an international “league of nations” to help provide for mutual “protection against external aggression” and, thus, to discourage it and reduce the need to go to war.  Still, when war cannot be avoided, it should be declared rather than launched by means of a sneak attack; secondly, there are legitimate limits that prohibit, for example, trying to exterminate or subjugate all members of the enemy society; third, when a war is over, the winning party cannot destroy the civil freedom of the losing parties, as by enslaving them; and, fourth, certain “rights of peace” must be assured and honored for all involved.  Thus the ultimate goal of international relations and of the league of nations should be the ideal of “perpetual peace” among different states that share our planet (Justice, pp. 41, 43, 91-95, 113, 136-141, 146, 151-158; for more on Kant’s version of the social contract theory, see Writings, pp. 73-85, and for more on his views on war and “perpetual peace,” see Writings, pp. 93-130).  Thus we see Kant applying his own theory of justice in three areas:  in the area of private law having to do with the securing of property rights, in the area of public law having to do with retributive punishment for crimes committed, and in the area of international justice concerned with war and peace.

What shall we critically say about this theory?  First, it argues for a sense of justice in terms of objective, non-arbitrary right—against, say, Hobbes and Hume.  Second, this sense of justice is of a piece with Kant’s categorical imperative, in that the rules of justice (e.g., regarding property rights, punishment, and war) are universalizable, designed to respect persons as intrinsically valuable, and conforming to the principle of autonomy.  Third, if Hume is correct in suggesting that we can never logically infer what ought to be from what actually is, then Kant’s is the only theory we have considered thus far that can pass the test.  To focus the issue, ask the question, why should we be just?  For Plato, this is the way to achieve the fulfillment of a well-ordered soul.  For Aristotle, the achievement and exercising of moral virtue is a necessary condition of human flourishing.  For Augustine and Aquinas, God’s eternal law requires that we, as God’s personal creatures, should be just, with our salvation at stake.  For Hobbes, practicing justice is required by enlightened self-interest.  For Hume, even though our being just may not benefit us directly all the time, it is conducive to public utility or the good of the society of which we are members.  But for each of these claims, we can ask, so what?  If any combination of these claims were to turn out to be correct, we could still legitimately ask why we should therefore be just.  Are we to assume that we ought to do whatever it takes to achieve a well-ordered soul or to flourish or to comply with God’s will or to serve our own self-interest or public utility?  Why?  Consider Kant’s answer:  we should try to be just because it’s the right thing to do and because it is our duty, as rational, moral agents, to try to do what is right.  Kant’s analysis of justice works well; and, given that, his applications to property rights, crime and punishment, and war and peace are also impressive.  Yet his theory is commonly rejected as too idealistic to be realistically applicable in the so-called “real world,” because it maintains that some things can be absolutely unjust and are, thus, categorically impermissible, regardless of likely consequences.  His theory as we have considered it here is a paradigmatic example of the view of justice being advocated in this article, as essentially requiring respect for persons as free, rational agents.  Yet Kant’s inflexibility in other points of application, such as in his absolute prohibition against lying to a would-be murderer in order to save innocent human life (Ethical, pp. 162-166), his idea that women and servants are merely “passive citizens” unfit to vote, and his categorical denial of any right to resistance or revolution against oppression (Justice, pp. 120, 124-128), is problematic here, inviting an alternative such as is represented by Mill’s utilitarianism.

b. Mill

Let us consider a bit of Karl Marx (and his collaborator Friedrich Engels) as a quick transition between Kant and Mill.  Kant represents the very sort of bourgeois conception of justice against which Marx and Engels protest in their call, in The Communist Manifesto, for a socialistic revolution.  Marx explains the ideal of socio-economic equality he advocates with the famous slogan that all should be required to contribute to society to the extent of their abilities and all should be allowed to receive from society in accordance with their needs.  John Stuart Mill, a nineteenth-century English philosopher, was aware of the call for a Communist revolution and advocated progressive liberal reform as an alternative path to political evolution.  Whereas Kant was the first great deontologist, Mill subscribed to the already established tradition of utilitarianism.  Although earlier British thinkers (including Hobbes and Hume) were proto-utilitarians, incorporating elements of the theory into their own worldviews, the movement, as such, is usually thought to stem from the publication of Jeremy Bentham’s Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation in 1789.  He there proposes the “principle of utility,” which he also later calls the “greatest happiness” principle, as the desirable basis for individual and collective decision-making:  “By the principle of utility is meant that principle which approves or disapproves of every action whatsoever, according to the tendency which it appears to have to augment or diminish the happiness of the party whose interest is in question.”  That single sentence establishes the ultimate criterion for utilitarian reasoning and the root of a great movement.  A famous lawyer named John Austin, under whom Mill studied, wrote a book of jurisprudence based on Bentham’s “principle of general utility.”  Mill’s father, James Mill, was a friend and disciple of Bentham and educated his only son also to be a utilitarian.  Near the end of his life, Mill observed that it was the closest thing to a religion in which his father raised him.  And, if he was not the founder of this secular religion, he clearly became its most effective evangelist.  In Utilitarianism, his own great essay in ethical theory, Mill gives his own statement of the principle of utility (again employing a curiously religious word):  “The creed which accepts as the foundation of morals, Utility, or the Greatest Happiness Principle, holds that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness.”  He immediately proceeds to interpret human happiness and unhappiness (as Bentham had done) in hedonistic terms of pleasure and pain (Utilitarianism, pp. 33-34, 329, 257).  This presents the deceptive appearance of a remarkably simple rubric for practical judgment:  if an action generates an excess of pleasure over pain, that contributes to human happiness, which is our greatest good, making the action right; on the other hand, if an action generates an excess of pain over pleasure, that contributes to human unhappiness, which is our greatest evil, making the action wrong.  But what is deceptive about this is the notion that we can sufficiently anticipate future consequences to be able to predict where our actions will lead us.  (Notice, also, that unlike Kantian deontology, which makes what is right independent of good consequences, utilitarianism makes the former a function of the latter.)

Mill acknowledges that concern about a possible conflict between utility and justice has always been “one of the strongest obstacles” to the acceptance of utilitarianism.  If permanently enslaving a minority could produce overwhelming happiness for a majority (he was personally opposed to slavery as an unconscionable violation of human liberty), then, given that utility is the value that trumps all others, why shouldn’t the injustice of slavery be accepted as a (regrettably) necessary means to a socially desirable end, the former, however unfortunate, being thus justified?  Mill thinks that the key to solving this alleged problem is that of conceptual analysis, that if we properly understand what “utility” and “justice” are all about, we shall be able to see that no genuine conflict between them is possible.  We have already discerned what the former concept means and now need to elucidate the latter.  Mill lays out five dimensions of justice as we use the term:  (1) respecting others’ “legal rights” is considered just, while violating them is unjust; (2) respecting the “moral right” someone has to something is just, while violating it is unjust; (3) it is considered just to give a person what “he deserves” and unjust to deny it; (4) it is thought unjust to “break faith” with another, while keeping faith with others is just; and (5) in some circumstances, it is deemed unjust “to be partial” in one’s judgments and just to be impartial.  People commonly associate all of these with justice, and they do seem to represent legitimate aspects of the virtue.  (Interestingly, Mill rejects the idea “of equality” as essential to our understanding of justice, a stand which would be problematic for Marxists.)  As he seeks his own common denominator for these various dimensions of justice, he observes that justice always goes beyond generic right and wrong to involve what “some individual person can claim from us as his moral right.”  This entails the legitimate sense that anyone who has committed an injustice deserves to be punished somehow (which connects with Kant).  Mill thinks all this boils down to the idea that justice is a term “for certain moral requirements, which, regarded collectively, stand higher in the scale of social utility,” being more obligatory “than any others.”  But this means that justice, properly understood, is a name for the most important of “social utilities” (ibid., pp. 296-301, 305, 309, 320-321).  Therefore there purportedly cannot be any genuine conflict between utility and justice.  If there ever were circumstances in which slavery were truly useful to humanity, then presumably it would be just; the reason it is (typically) unjust is that it violates utility.  The main goal here is to reduce justice to social utility, in such a way as to rule out, by definition, any ultimate conflict between the two.  Thus, the social role played by our sense of justice is allegedly that it serves the common good.

Mill’s other great work is On Liberty, which provides us with a connecting link between this utilitarian theory and applications of it to particular social issues.  The problem Mill sets for himself here is where to draw a reasonable line between areas in which society can rightly proscribe behavior and those in which people should be allowed the freedom to do as they will.  When is it just to interfere with a person’s acting on personal choice?  To solve this problem, which is as relevant today as it was a century and a half ago, he proposes his “one very simple principle” of liberty, which he states in two slightly different ways:  (1) the “self-protection” version holds that people can only legitimately interfere with the freedom of action of others to protect themselves from them; (2) the “harm” version maintains that force can only be justifiably used against other members of community to prevent their harming others.  It is not acceptable to use power against others to stop them from hurting only themselves.  Mill candidly admits that this principle is reasonably feasible only with regard to mature, responsible members of civilized societies—not to children or to the insane or even necessarily to primitive peoples who cannot make informed judgments about their own true good.  He decisively renounces any appeal to abstract rights as a basis for this principle, basing it simply on “utility in the largest sense, grounded on the permanent interests of a man as a progressive being.”  Notice that this presupposes that we can distinguish between other-regarding behavior, which may be justifiably regulated, and purely self-regarding behavior, which may not be.  If that turns out to be a false distinction, then Mill’s theory may collapse.  At any rate, he articulates at least three areas of social life in which people’s liberty should be “absolute and unqualified”:  (a) that of freedom of thought and expression; (b) that of freedom of personal lifestyle; and (c) the freedom to associate with others of one’s choice, so long as it is for peaceful purposes.  He seems confident that utility will always require that freedom be protected in these areas (ibid., pp. 135-138).  In other words, on this liberal utilitarian view, it would always be unjust for an individual or a social group, in a civilized society, deliberately to interfere with a responsible, rational person’s actions in any combination of these areas.

Let us now see how Mill applies his utilitarian theory to three problems of justice that are still timely today.  First of all, the issue of punishment is one he considers in Utilitarianism, though his discussion is aimed at considering alternative accounts rather than conclusively saying what he himself thinks (we might also observe that, in this short passage, he attacks the social contract theory as a useless fiction) (ibid., pp. 311-313).  As a utilitarian, he favors the judicious use of punishment in order to deter criminal activity.  He believes in the utility/justice of self-defense and sees the right to punish as anchored in that.  In 1868, as an elected member of Parliament, he made a famous speech in the House of Commons supporting capital punishment on utilitarian grounds.  Although it is clear that he would like to be able to support a bill for its abolition, the lawful order of society, a necessary condition of societal well-being, requires this means of deterring the most heinous crimes, such as aggravated murder.  He even thinks it a quicker, more humane punishment than incarcerating someone behind bars for the rest of his life.  Mill does worry about the possibility of executing an innocent person, but he thinks a carefully managed legal system can render this danger “extremely rare” (“Punishment,” pp. 266-272).  Thus his utilitarian theory provides him with a basis for supporting capital punishment as morally justifiable.  A second famous application of his utilitarian theory of justice Mill makes is to the issue of equal opportunity for women.  In the very first paragraph of The Subjection of Women, Mill maintains that “the principle which regulates the existing social relations between the two sexes—the legal subordination of one sex to the other—is wrong in itself, and now one of the chief hindrances to human improvement; and that it ought to be replaced by a principle of perfect equality, admitting no power or privilege on the one side, nor disability on the other.”  So he does not call for the preferential treatment of “affirmative action” but only for equal opportunity.  Unlike contemporary feminists, he does not appeal to women’s human rights as his rationale, but only to the maximization of “human happiness” and the liberty “that makes life valuable” (Subjection, pp. 1, 26, 101).  Here, again, we have an issue of social justice to which his utilitarian theory is applied, generating liberal conclusions.  Our third issue of application is that of international non-intervention.  Mill’s general principle here is that using force against others is prima facie unjust. Although defensive wars can be justifiable, aggressive ones are not.  It can be justifiable to go to war without being attacked or directly threatened with an attack, for example, to help civilize a barbarian society, which, as such, allegedly has no rights.  It can be justifiable to save a subjected population from the oppression of a despotic government (“Non-Intervention,” pp. 376-383).  All of this is presumably a function of utilitarian welfare.  Once more, a still timely moral issue has been addressed using the utilitarian theory of justice.

These applications all plausibly utilize the values and reasoning of utilitarianism, which, by its very nature, must be consequentialist.  From that perspective, the deterrence approach to punishment, including capital punishment, seems appropriate, as do Mill’s call for equal opportunity for women and his measured position on international interventionism.  Surely, the premium he places on human happiness is admirable, as is his universal perspective, which views all humans as counting.  The problem is in his assumptions that all values are relative to consequences, that human happiness is the ultimate good, and that this reduces to the maximization of pleasure and the minimization of pain.  The upshot of this position is that, in principle, nothing can  be categorically forbidden, that, given sufficiently desirable ends, any means necessary to achieve them can be justified.  If we really believe that there can be no genuine conflict between justice and utility because the former is merely the most important part of the latter, then the rules of justice are reducible to calculations regarding what is generally conducive to the greatest happiness for the greatest number of people—mere inductive generalizations which must permit of exceptions; at least Mill’s ambiguity leaves him open to this interpretation.  There would seem to be a tension in Mill’s thought:  on the one hand, he wants to respect the liberty of all (civilized) responsible persons as rational agents; but, on the other hand, his commitment to utilitarianism would seem to subordinate that respect to the greatest good for the greatest number of people, allowing for the possibility of sacrificing the interests of the few to those of the many.

5. Contemporary Philosophers

From its founding, American political thought had an enduring focus on justice.  The Preamble to the American Constitution says that one of its primary goals is to “establish justice.”  Founding father James Madison, in 1788, wrote in The Federalist Papers that justice should be the goal of all government and of all civil society, that people are willing to risk even liberty in its pursuit.  American schoolchildren are made to memorize and recite a Pledge of Allegiance that ends with the words “with liberty and justice for all.”  So justice is an abiding American ideal.  We shall now consider how one of America’s greatest philosophers, John Rawls, addresses this ideal.  We should notice how he places a greater emphasis on equality than do most of his European predecessors—perhaps reflecting the conviction of the American Declaration of Independence that “all men are created equal.”  (This greater emphasis may reflect the influence of Marx, whom he occasionally mentions.)  After considering the formidable contributions of Rawls to justice theory and some of its applications, we shall conclude this survey with a brief treatment of several post-Rawlsian alternatives.  A key focus that will distinguish this section from previous ones is the effort to achieve a conception of justice that strikes a reasonable balance between liberty and equality.

a. Rawls

Rawls burst into prominence in 1958 with the publication of his game-changing paper, “Justice as Fairness.”  Though it was not his first important publication, it revived the social contract theory that had been languishing in the wake of Hume’s critique and its denigration by utilitarians and pragmatists, though it was a Kantian version of it that Rawls advocated.  This led to a greatly developed book version, A Theory of Justice, published in 1971, arguably the most important book of American philosophy published in the second half of the last century.  Rawls makes it clear that his theory, which he calls “justice as fairness,” assumes a Kantian view of persons as “free and equal,” morally autonomous, rational agents, who are not necessarily egoists.  He also makes it clear early on that he means to present his theory as a preferable alternative to that of utilitarians.  He asks us to imagine persons in a hypothetical “initial situation” which he calls “the original position” (corresponding to the “state of nature” or “natural condition” of Hobbes, but clearly not presented as any sort of historical or pre-historical fact).  This is strikingly characterized by what Rawls calls “the veil of ignorance,” a device designed to minimize the influence of selfish bias in attempting to determine what would be just.  If you must decide on what sort of society you could commit yourself to accepting as a permanent member and were not allowed to factor in specific knowledge about yourself—such as your gender, race, ethnic identity, level of intelligence, physical strength, quickness and stamina, and so forth—then you would presumably exercise the rational choice to make the society as fair for everyone as possible, lest you find yourself at the bottom of that society for the rest of your life.  In such a “purely hypothetical” situation, Rawls believes that we would rationally adopt two basic principles of justice for our society:  “the first requires equality in the assignment of basic rights and duties, while the second holds that social and economic inequalities, for example inequalities of wealth and authority, are just only if they result in compensating benefits for everyone, and in particular for the least advantaged members of society.”  Here we see Rawls conceiving of justice, the primary social virtue, as requiring equal basic liberties for all citizens and a presumption of equality even regarding socio-economic goods.  He emphasizes the point that these principles rule out as unjust the utilitarian justification of disadvantages for some on account of greater advantages for others, since that would be rationally unacceptable to one operating under the veil of ignorance.  Like Kant, Rawls is opposed to the teleological or consequentialist gambit of defining the right (including the just) in terms of “maximizing the good”; he rather, like Kant, the deontologist, is committed to a “priority of the right over the good.”  Justice is not reducible to utility or pragmatic desirability.  We should notice that the first principle of justice, which requires maximum equality of rights and duties for all members of society, is prior in “serial or lexical order” to the second, which specifies how socio-economic inequalities can be justified (Theory, pp. 12-26, 31, 42-43).  Again, this is anti-utilitarian, in that no increase in socio-economic benefits for anyone can ever justify anything less than maximum equality of rights and duties for all.  Thus, for example, if enslaving a few members of society generated vastly more benefits for the majority than liabilities for them, such a bargain would be categorically ruled out as unjust.

Rawls proceeds to develop his articulation of these two principles of justice more carefully.  He reformulates the first one in terms of maximum equal liberty, writing that “each person is to have an equal right to the most extensive basic liberty compatible with a similar liberty for others.”  The basic liberties intended concern such civil rights as are protected in our Constitution—free speech, freedom of assembly, freedom of conscience, the right to private property, the rights to vote and hold public office, freedom from arbitrary arrest and seizure, etc.  The lexical priority of this first principle requires that it be categorical in that the only justification for limiting any basic liberties would be to enhance other basic liberties; for example, it might be just to limit free access of the press to a sensational legal proceeding in order to protect the right of the accused to a fair trial.  Rawls restates his second principle to maintain that “social and economic inequalities are to be arranged so that they are both (a) reasonably expected to be to everyone’s advantage, and (b) attached to positions and offices open to all.”  Thus socio-economic inequalities can be justified, but only if both conditions are met.  The first condition (a) is “the difference principle” and takes seriously the idea that every socio-economic difference separating one member of society from others must be beneficial to all, including the person ranked lowest.  The second condition is one of “fair equality of opportunity,” in that socio-economic advantages must be connected to positions to which all members of society could have access.  For example, the office of the presidency has attached to it greater social prestige and income than is available to most of us.  Is that just?  It can be, assuming that all of us, as citizens, could achieve that office with its compensations and that even those of us at or near the bottom of the socio-economic scale benefit from intelligent, talented people accepting the awesome responsibilities of that office.  Just as the first principle must be lexically prior to the second, Rawls also maintains that “fair opportunity is prior to the difference principle.”  Thus, if we have to choose between equal opportunity for all and socio-economically benefiting “the least advantaged” members of society, the former has priority over the latter.  Most of us today might be readily sympathetic to the first principle and the equal opportunity condition, while finding the difference principle to be objectionably egalitarian, to the point of threatening incentives to contribute more than is required.  Rawls does consider a “mixed conception” of justice that most of us would regard as more attractive “arising when the principle of average utility constrained by a certain social minimum is substituted for the difference principle, everything else remaining unchanged.”  But there would be a problem of fairly agreeing on that acceptable social minimum, and it would change with shifting contingent circumstances.  It is curious that his own theory of “justice as fairness” gets attacked by socialists such as Nielsen (whom we shall consider) for sacrificing equality for the sake of liberty and by libertarians such as Nozick (whom we shall also consider) for giving up too much liberty for the sake of equality.  Rawls briefly suggests that his theory of justice as fairness might be applied to international relations, in general, and to just war theory, in particular (ibid., pp. 60-65, 75, 83, 302-303, 316, 378).

Rawls applies his theory of justice to the domestic issue of civil disobedience.  No society is perfectly just.  A generally or “nearly just society” can have unjust laws, in which case its citizens may or may not have a duty to comply with them, depending on how severely unjust they are.  If the severity of the injustice is not great, then respect for democratic majority rule might morally dictate compliance.  Otherwise, citizens can feel a moral obligation to engage in civil disobedience, which Rawls defines as “a public, nonviolent, conscientious yet political act contrary to law usually done with the aim of bringing about a change in the law or policies of the government.”  Certain conditions must be met in order that an act of civil disobedience be justified:  (1) it should normally address violations of equal civil liberties (the first principle of justice) and/or of “fair equality of opportunity” (the second part of the second principle), with violations of the difference principle (the first part of the second principle) being murkier and, thus, harder to justify; (2) the act of civil disobedience should come only after appeals to the political majority have been reasonably tried and failed; (3) it must seem likely to accomplish more good than harm for the social order.  Yet, even if all three of these conditions seem to be met and the disobedient action seems right, there remains the practical question of whether it would be “wise or prudent,” under the circumstances, to engage in the act of civil disobedience.  Ultimately, every individual must decide for himself or herself whether such action is morally and prudentially justifiable or not as reasonably and responsibly as possible.  The acts of civil disobedience of Martin Luther King (to whom Rawls refers in a footnote) seem to have met all the conditions, to have been done in the name of justice, and to have been morally justified (ibid., pp. 350-357, 363-367, 372-376, 389-390, 364n).

Rawls’s second book was Political Liberalism.  Here he works out how a just political conception might develop a workable “overlapping consensus” despite the challenges to social union posed by a pluralism of “reasonable comprehensive doctrines.”  This, of course, calls for some explanation.  A just society must protect basic liberties equally for all of its members, including freedom of thought and its necessary condition, freedom of expression.  But, in a free society that protects these basic liberties, a pluralism of views and values is likely to develop, such that people can seriously disagree about matters they hold dear.  They will develop their own “comprehensive doctrines,” or systems of beliefs that may govern all significant aspects of their lives.  These may be religious (like Christianity) or philosophical (like Kantianism) or moral (like utilitarian).  Yet a variety of potentially conflicting comprehensive doctrines may be such that all are reasonable.  In such a case, social unity requires respect for and tolerance of other sets of beliefs.  It would be unjust deliberately to suppress reasonable comprehensive doctrines merely because they are different from our own.  The problem of political liberalism nowadays is how we can establish “a stable and just society whose free and equal citizens are deeply divided by conflicting and even incommensurable religious, philosophical, and moral doctrines.”  What is needed is a shared “political conception of justice” that is neutral regarding competing comprehensive doctrines.  This could allow for “an overlapping consensus of reasonable comprehensive doctrines,” such that tolerance and mutual respect are operative even among those committed to incompatible views and values, so long as they are reasonable (Liberalism, pp. 291-292, 340-342, 145, xviii, 13, 152n., 59-60, 133, 154-155, 144, 134).  Thus, for example, a Christian Kantian and an atheistic utilitarian, while sincerely disagreeing on many ethical principles, philosophical ideas, and religious beliefs, can unite in mutually accepting, for instance, the American Constitution as properly binding on all of us equally.  This agreement will enable them mutually to participate in social cooperation, the terms of which are fair and reciprocal and which can contribute to the reasonable good of the entire society.

Near the end of his life, Rawls published The Law of Peoples, in which he tried to apply his theory of justice to international relations.  Given that not all societies act justly and that societies have a right to defend themselves against aggressive violent force, there can be a right to go to war (jus ad bellum).  Yet even then, not all is fair in war, and rules of just warfare (jus in bello) should be observed:  (1) the goal must be a “just and lasting peace”; (2) it must be waged in defense of freedom and security from aggression; (3) reasonable attempts must be made not to attack innocent non-combatants; (4) the human rights of enemies (for example, against being tortured) must be respected; (5) attempts should be made to establish peaceful relations; and (6) practical tactics must always remain within the parameters of moral principles.  After hostilities have ceased, just conquerors must treat their conquered former enemies with respect—not, for example, enslaving them or denying them civil liberties.  Rawls adds a very controversial “supreme emergency exemption” in relation to the third rule—when a relatively just society’s very survival is in desperate peril, its attacking enemy civilian populations, as by bombing cities, can be justifiable.  More generally, Rawls applies his theory of justice to international relations, generating eight rules regarding how the people of other societies must be treated.  While we do not have time to explore them all here, the last one is sufficiently provocative to be worth our considering:  “Peoples have a duty to assist other peoples living under unfavorable conditions that prevent their having a just or decent political and social regime.”  This, of course, goes beyond not exploiting, cheating, manipulating, deceiving, and interfering with others to a positive duty of trying to help them, at the cost of time, money, and other resources.  Justice demands that we try to assist what Rawls calls “burdened societies,” so that doing so is not morally supererogatory.  What is most interesting here is what Rawls refuses to say.  While different peoples, internationally speaking, might be imagined in an original position under the veil of ignorance, and Rawls would favor encouraging equal liberties and opportunities for all, he refuses to apply the difference principle globally in such a way as to indicate that justice requires a massive redistribution of wealth from richer to poorer societies (Peoples, pp. 94-96, 98-99, 37, 106, 114-117).

From a critical perspective, Rawls’s theory of civil disobedience is excellent, as are his theory of political liberalism and his version of the just war theory, except for that “supreme emergency exemption,” which uncharacteristically tries to make right a function of teleological good.  His views on international aid seem so well worked out that, ironically, they call into question part of his general theory of justice itself.  It does not seem plausible that the difference principle should apply intrasocietally but not internationally.  The problem may be with the difference principle itself.  It is not at all clear that rational agents in a hypothetical original position would adopt such an egalitarian principle.  The veil of ignorance leading to this controversial principle can itself be questioned as artificial and unrealistic; one might object that, far from being methodologically neutral, it sets up a bias (towards, for example, being risk-aversive) that renders Rawls’s own favored principles of justice almost a foregone conclusion.  Indeed, the “mixed conception” that Rawls himself considers and rejects seems more plausible and more universally applicable—keeping the first principle and the second part of the second but replacing the difference principle with one of average utility, constrained by some social minimum, adjustable with changing circumstances.  Thus we could satisfactorily specify the requirements of an essentially Kantian conception of justice, as requiring respect for the dignity of all persons as free and equal, rational moral agents.  While less egalitarian than what Rawls offers, it might prove an attractive alternative.  To what extent should liberty be constrained by equality in a just society?  This is a central issue that divides him from many post-Rawlsians, to a few of whom we now briefly turn.

b. Post-Rawls

Rawls’s monumental work on justice theory revitalized political philosophy in the United States and other English-speaking countries.  In this final subsection, we shall briefly survey some of the most important recent attempts to provide preferable alternatives to Rawls’s conception of justice.  They will represent six different approaches.  We shall consider, in succession, (1) the libertarian approach of Robert Nozick, (2) the socialistic one of Kai Nielsen, (3) the communitarian one of Michael Sandel, (4) the globalist one of Thomas Pogge, (5) the feminist one of Martha Nussbaum, and (6) the rights-based one of Michael Boylan.  As this is merely a quick survey, we shall not delve much into the details of their theories (limiting ourselves to a single work by each) or explore their applications or do much in the way of a critique of them.  But the point will be to get a sense of several recent approaches to developing views of justice in the wake of Rawls.

(1)    Nozick

Nozick (a departmental colleague of Rawls at Harvard) was one of the first and remains one of the most famous critics of Rawls’s liberal theory of justice.  Both are fundamentally committed to individual liberty.  But as a libertarian, Nozick is opposed to compromising individual liberty in order to promote socio-economic equality and advocates a “minimal state” as the only sort that can be socially just.  In Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1974), especially in its famous chapter on “Distributive Justice,” while praising Rawls’s first book as the most important “work in political and moral philosophy” since that of Mill, Nozick  argues for what he calls an “entitlement conception of justice” in terms of three principles of just holdings.  First, anyone who justly acquires any holding is rightly entitled to keep and use it.  Second, anyone who acquires any holding by means of a just transfer of property is rightly entitled to keep and use it.  It is only through some combination of these two approaches that anyone is rightly entitled to any holding.  But some people acquire holdings unjustly—e.g., by theft or fraud or force—so that there are illegitimate holdings.  So, third, justice can require the rectification of unjust past acquisitions.  These three principles of just holdings—“the principle of acquisition of holdings, the principle of transfer of holdings, and the principle of rectification of the violations of the first two principles”—constitute the core of Nozick’s libertarian entitlement theory of justice.  People should be entitled to use their own property as they see fit, so long as they are entitled to it.  On this view, any pattern of distribution, such as Rawls’s difference principle, that would force people to give up any holdings to which they are entitled in order to give it to someone else (i.e., a redistribution of wealth) is unjust.  Thus, for Nozick, any state, such as ours or one Rawls would favor, that is “more extensive” than a minimal state and redistributes wealth by taxing those who are relatively well off to benefit the disadvantaged necessarily “violates people’s rights” (State, pp. 149, 183, 230, 150-153, 230-231, 149).

(2)    Nielsen

Nielsen, as a socialist (against both Rawls and Nozick) considers equality to be a more fundamental ideal than individual liberty; this is more in keeping with Marxism than with the liberal/libertarian tradition that has largely stemmed from Locke.  (Whereas capitalism supports the ownership and control of the means of producing and distribution material goods by private capital or wealth, socialism holds that they should be owned and controlled by society as a whole.)  If Nozick accuses Rawls of going too far in requiring a redistribution of wealth, Nielsen criticizes him for favoring individual liberty at the expense of social equality.  In direct contrast to Rawls’s two liberal principles of justice, in “Radical Egalitarian Justice:  Justice as Equality,” Nielsen proposes his own two socialistic principles constituting the core of his “egalitarian conception of justice.”  In his first principle, he calls for “equal basic liberties and opportunities” (rather than for merely “equal basic liberties”), including the opportunities “for meaningful work, for self-determination, and political participation,” which he considers important to promote “equal moral autonomy and equal self-respect.”  Also (unlike Rawls) he does not claim any lexical priority for either principle over the other.  His sharper departure from Rawls can be found in his second principle, which is to replace the difference principle that allegedly justified socio-economic inequality.  After specifying a few qualifications, it calls for “the income and wealth” of society “to be so divided that each person will have a right to an equal share” and for the burdens of society “also to be equally shared, subject, of course, to limitations by differing abilities and differing situations.”  He argues that his own second principle would better promote “equal self-respect and equal moral autonomy” among the members of society.  Thus we might eliminate social stratification and class exploitation, in accordance with the ideals of Marxist humanism (“Equality,” pp. 209, 211-213, 222-225).

(3)    Sandel

Sandel, as a communitarian, argues (against Rawls and Nozick) that the well-being of a community takes precedence over individual liberty and (against Nielsen) over the socio-economic welfare of its members.  While acknowledging that Rawls is not so “narrowly individualistic” as to rule out the value of building social community, in Liberalism and the Limits of Justice, he maintains that the individualism of persons in the original position is such that “a sense of community” is not a basic “constituent of their identify as such,” so that community is bound to remain secondary and derivative in the Rawlsian theory.  To deny that community values help constitute one’s personal identity is to render impossible any preexisting interpersonal good from which a sense of right can be derived.  Thus, for Sandel, Rawls’s myopic theory of human nature gives him no basis for any pre-political natural rights.  So his conception of justice based on this impoverished view must fail to reflect “the shared self-understandings” of who they are as members of community that must undergird the basic structure of political society.  Through the interpersonal relationships of community, we establish “more or less enduring attachments and commitments” that help define who we are, as well as the values that will help characterize our sense of justice as a common good that cannot be properly understood by individuals detached from community.  Thus justice must determine what is right as serving the goods we embrace in a social context—“as members of this family or community or nation or people, as bearers of this history, as sons and daughters of that revolution, as citizens of this republic” rather than as abstract individuals (Limits, pp. 66, 60-65, 87, 150, 172-174, 179, 183, 179).

(4)    Pogge

Pogge develops a globalist interpretation of justice as fairness that, in a sense, is more consistent than Rawls’s own.  More specifically, it not only accepts the difference principle but wants to apply it on an international level as well as nationally.  In “An Egalitarian Law of Peoples,” Pogge observes that Rawls means his theory of justice to be relatively “egalitarian.”  And, as applied intranationally, so it is.  But, as applied internationally, it is not.  As he says, there is a disconnect “between Rawls’s conception of domestic and of global justice.”  (We should note that, like Sandel’s critique, which we just considered, Pogge’s is not a complete theory of justice, but more a modification of Rawls’s own.)  While Rawls does believe that well-off societies have a duty to assist burdened societies, he rejects the idea of a global application of his difference principle.  What Pogge is proposing is a global egalitarian principle of distributive justice.  He thinks that this will address socio-economic equalities that are to the detriment of the world’s worst-off persons.  What he proposes is “a global resources tax, or GRT.”  This means that, although each of the peoples of our planet “owns and fully controls all resources within its national territory,” it will be taxed on all of the resources it extracts.  If it uses those extracted resources itself, it must pay the tax itself.  If it sells some to other societies, presumably at least part of the tax burden will be borne by buyers in the form of higher sales prices.  “The GRT is then a tax on consumption” of our planet’s resources.  Corporations extracting resources (such as oil companies and coal mining companies) would pay their taxes to their governments which, in turn, would be responsible for transferring funds to disadvantaged societies to help the global poor.  Such payments should be regarded as “a matter of entitlement rather than charity,” an obligation of international justice.  If the governments of the poorer states were honest, they could disburse the funds; if they were corrupt, then transfers could go through United Nations agencies and/or nongovernmental organizations.  At any rate, they should be channeled toward societies in which they could improve the lot of the poor and disadvantaged.  (Of course, less well-off societies would be free to refuse such funds, if they so chose.)  But, one might wonder, would well-off societies only be motivated to pay their fair share by benevolence, a sense of justice, and possible shame at being exposed for not doing so?  No, there could be international sanctions:  “Once the agency facilitating the flow of GRT payments reports that a country has not met its obligations under the scheme, all other countries are required to impose duties on imports from, and perhaps also similar levies on exports to, this country to raise funds equivalent to its GRT obligations plus the cost of these enforcement measures.”  Pogge believes that well-off societies should recognize that his more egalitarian model of international relations is also more just than Rawls’s law of peoples (“Egalitarian,” pp. 195-196, 210, 199-202, 205, 219, 224).

(5)    Nussbaum

Nussbaum, like Pogge (and unlike Nozick and Nielsen), does not so much reject Rawls’s liberal conception of justice as extend its explicit application.  In Sex and Social Justice, she argues for a feminist interpretation of justice, using what she calls a “capabilities approach” that connects with “the tradition of Kantian liberalism,” nowadays represented by Rawls, tapping into their “notions of dignity and liberty,” as a foundation for discussing the demands of justice regarding “women’s equality and women’s human rights.”  The feminism she embraces has five key dimensions:  (1) an internationalism, such that it is not limited to any one particular culture; (2) a humanism, such as affirms a basic equal worth in all human beings and promotes justice for all; (3) a commitment to liberalism as the perspective that best protects and promotes the “basic human capacities for choice and reasoning” that render all humans as having an equal worth; (4) a sensitivity to the cultural shaping of our preferences and desires; and (5) a concern for sympathetic understanding between the sexes.  She expresses an appreciation for the primary goods at the core of Rawls’s theory, while asserting that his analysis does not go far enough.  She offers her own list of ten “central human functional capabilities” that must be respected by a just society:  (1) life of a normal, natural duration; (2) bodily health and integrity, including adequate nourishment and shelter; (3) bodily integrity regarding, for example, freedom of movement and security against assault; (4) freedom to exercise one’s senses, imagination, and thought as one pleases, which includes freedom of expression; (5) freedom to form emotional attachments to persons and things, which includes freedom of association; (6) the development and exercise of practical reason, the capacity to form one’s own conception of the good and to try to plan one’s own life, which includes the protection of freedom of conscience; (7) freedom of affiliation on equal terms with others, which involves provisions of nondiscrimination; (8) concern for and possible relationships with animals, plants, and the world of nature; (9) the freedom to play, to seek amusement, and to enjoy recreational activities; and (10) some control over one’s own political environment, including the right to vote, and one’s material environment, including the rights to seek meaningful work and to hold property.  All of these capabilities are essential to our functioning as flourishing human beings and should be assured for all citizens of a just society.  But, historically, women have been and still are short-changed with respect to them and should be guaranteed their protection in the name of justice (Sex, pp. 24, 6-14, 34, 40-42).

(6)    Boylan

Boylan has recently presented “a ‘rights-based’ deontological approach based upon the necessary conditions for human action.”  In A Just Society, he observes that human goods are more or less deeply “embedded” as conditions of human action, leading to a hierarchy that can be set forth.  There are two levels of basic goods.  The most deeply embedded of these, such as food, clothing, shelter, protection from physical harm, are absolutely necessary for any meaningful human action.  The second level of basic goods comprises (less) deeply embedded ones, such as basic knowledge and skills such as are imparted by education, social structures that allow us to trust one another, basic assurance that we will not be exploited, and the protection of basic human rights.  Next, there are three levels of secondary goods.  The most embedded of these are life enhancing, if not necessary for any meaningful action, such as respect, equal opportunity, and the capacity to form and follow one’s own plan of life and to participate actively and equally in community, characterized by shared values.  A second level of secondary goods comprises those that are useful for human action, such as having and being able to use property, being able to benefit from one’s own labor, and being able to pursue goods typically owned by most of one’s fellow citizens.  The third level of secondary goods comprises those that are least embedded as conditions of meaningful action but still desirable as luxuries, such as being able to seek pleasant objectives that most of one’s fellow citizens cannot expect to achieve and being able to compete for somewhat more than others in one’s society.  The more deeply embedded goods are as conditions of meaningful human action, the more right to them people have.  Boylan follows Kant and Rawls in holding an ultimate moral imperative is that individual human agents and their rights must be respected.  This is a matter of justice, distributive justice involving a fair distribution of social goods and services and retributive justice involving proper ways for society to treat those who violate the rules.  A just society has a duty to provide basic goods equally to all of its members, if it can do so.  But things get more complicated with regards to secondary goods.  A just society will try to provide the first level of secondary goods, those that are life enhancing, equally to all its members.  Yet this becomes more problematic with the second and third levels of secondary goods—those that are useful and luxurious—as the conditions for meaningful human action have already been satisfied by more deeply embedded ones.  The need that people have to derive rewards for their work commensurate with their achievement would seem to militate against any guarantee of equal shares in these, even if society could provide them, although comparable achievement should be comparably rewarded.  Finally, in the area of retributive justice, we may briefly consider three scenarios.  First, when one person takes a tangible good from another person, justice requires that the perpetrator return to the victim some tangible good(s) of comparable worth, plus compensation proportionate to the harm done the victim by the loss.  Second, when one person takes an intangible good from another person, justice requires that the perpetrator give the victim some tangible good as adequate compensation for the pain and suffering caused by the loss.  And, third, when one person injures another person through the deprivation of a valued good that negatively affects society, society can justly incarcerate the perpetrator for a period of time proportionate to the loss (Society, pp. x, 53-54, 56-58, 131, 138, 143-144, 164-167, 174-175, 181, 183).

In conclusion, we might observe that, in this rights-based alternative, as in the previous five (the libertarian, the socialistic, the communitarian, the globalist, and the feminist) we have considered, there is an attempt to interpret justice as requiring respect for the dignity of all persons as free and equal, rational moral agents.  This historical survey has tracked the progressive development of this Kantian idea as becoming increasingly prominent in Western theories of justice.

6. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • Thomas Aquinas, On Law, Morality, and Politics, ed. William P. Baumgarth and Richard J. Regan, S.J. (called “Law”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1988.
  • Thomas Aquinas, Summa Theologica, trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province, Vol. One (called “Summa”).  New York:  Benziger Brothers, 1947.
  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, trans. Terence Irwin, Second Edition (called “Nicomachean”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1999.
  • Aristotle, On Rhetoric, trans. George A. Kennedy (called “Rhetoric”).  New York:  Oxford University Press, 1991.
  • Aristotle, Politics, trans. C. D. C. Reeve (called “Politics”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1998.
  • Augustine, The City of God, trans. Henry Bettenson (called “City”).  London:  Penguin Books, 1984.
  • Augustine, Of True Religion, trans. J. H. S. Burleigh (called “Religion”).  Chicago:  Henry Regnery, 1959.
  • Augustine, On Free Choice of the Will, trans. Thomas Williams (called “Choice”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1993.
  • Augustine, Political Writings, trans. and ed. Michael W. Tkacz and Douglas Kries (called “Political”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1994).
  • Michael Boylan, A Just Society (called “Society”).  Lanham, MD:  Rowman & Littlefield, 2004.
  • Thomas Hobbes, The Elements of Law, ed. J. C. A. Gaskin (called “Elements”).  Oxford:  Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Thomas Hobbes, Leviathan, ed. Edwin Curley.  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1994.
  • Thomas Hobbes, Man and Citizen, ed. Bernard Gert (called “Citizen”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1991.
  • Thomas Hobbes, Writings on Common Law and Hereditary Right, ed. Alan Cromartie and Quentin Skinner (called “Common”).  Oxford:  Oxford University Press, 2008.
  • David Hume, An Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, ed. J. B. Schneewind (called “Enquiry”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1983.
  • David Hume, Political Essays, ed. Knud Haakonssen (called “Essays”).  Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • David Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature, ed. David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton (called “Treatise”).  Oxford:  Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Immanuel Kant, Ethical Philosophy, trans. James W. Ellington, Second Edition (called “Ethical”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1994.
  • Immanuel Kant, Lectures on Ethics, trans. Louis Infield (called “Lectures”).  New York:  Harper & Row, 1963).
  • Immanuel Kant, Metaphysical Elements of Justice, trans. John Ladd, Second Edition (called “Justice”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1999.
  • Immanuel Kant, Political Writings, trans. H. B. Nisbet, ed. Hans Reiss, Second Edition (called “Writings”).  Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • John Locke, Second Treatise of Government, ed. C. B. Macpherson.  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1980.
  • Karl Marx, Selected Writings, ed. Lawrence H. Simon.  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1994.
  • John Stuart Mill, “A Few Words on Non-Intervention,” in Essays on Politics and Culture, ed. Gertrude Himmelfarb (called “Non-Intervention”).  Garden City, NY:  Anchor Books, 1963.
  • John Stuart Mill, “Capital Punishment,” in Public and Parliamentary Speeches, ed. John M. Robson and Bruce L. Kinzer (called “Punishment”).  Toronto:  University of Toronto Press, 1988.
  • John Stuart Mill, The Subjection of Women (called “Subjection”).  Mineola, NY:  Dover, 1997.
  • John Stuart Mill, Utilitarianism and Other Writings, ed. Mary Warnock (called “Utilitarianism”).  Cleveland:  World Publishing Company, 1962.
    • This anthology also contains some Bentham and some Austin.
  • Kai Nielsen, “Radical Egalitarian Justice:  Justice as Equality” (called “Equality”).  Social Theory and Practice, Vol. 5, No. 2, 1979.
  • Robert Nozick, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (called “State”).  New York:  Basic Books, 1974.
  • Martha C. Nussbaum, Sex and Social Justice (called “Sex”).  New York:  Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • Plato, Five Dialogues, trans. G. M. A. Grube (called “Dialogues”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1981.
  • Plato, Gorgias, trans. Donald J. Zeyl.  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1987.
  • Plato, The Laws, trans. Trevor J. Saunders (called “Laws”).  London:  Penguin Books, 1975.
  • Plato, Republic, trans. G. M. A. Grube, revised by C. D. C. Reeve.  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1992.
  • Thomas W. Pogge, “An Egalitarian Law of Peoples” (called “Egalitarian”).  Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 23, No. 3, 1994.
  • John Rawls, Collected Papers, ed. Samuel Freeman (called “Papers”).  Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 1999.
  • John Rawls, The Law of Peoples (called “Peoples”).  Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 1999.
  • John Rawls, Political Liberalism (called “Liberalism”).  New York:  Columbia University Press, 1996.
  • John Rawls, A Theory of Justice (called “Theory”).  Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 1971.
  • Jean-Jacques Rousseau, On the Social Contract, trans. G. D. H. Cole.  Mineola, NY:  Dover, 2003.
  • Michael J. Sandel, Liberalism and the Limits of Justice (called “Limits”).  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1982.
  • Robin Waterfield, trans., The First Philosophers (called “First”).  New York:  Oxford University Press, 2000.

b. Secondary Sources

  • John Arthur and William H. Shaw, ed., Justice and Economic Distribution.  Englewood Cliffs, NJ:  Prentice-Hall, 1978.
    • This is a good collection of contemporary readings, especially one by Kai Nielsen.
  • Jonathan Barnes, ed., The Cambridge Companion to Aristotle.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • The articles on Aristotle’s “Ethics” and “Politics” are particularly relevant.
  • Brian Barry, Justice and Impartiality.  New York:  Oxford University Press, 1995.
    • This is a good study.
  • Brian Barry, Theories of Justice.  Berkeley:  University of California Press, 1989.  This discussion makes up in depth what it lacks in breadth.
  • Hugo A. Bedau, ed., Justice and Equality.  Englewood Cliffs, NJ:  Prentice-Hall, 1971.
    • This is an old but still valuable anthology.
  • H. Gene Blocker and Elizabeth H. Smith, ed., John Rawls’ Theory of Social Justice.  Athens, OH:  Ohio University Press, 1980.
    • This is an early but still worthwhile collection of papers, with “Justice and International Relations,” by Charles R. Beitz, being particularly provocative.
  • Ronald Dworkin, Taking Rights Seriously.  Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 1977.
    • See, especially, the chapter on “Justice and Rights,” which contains a critique of Rawls’s theory.
  • Joel Feinberg, Doing and Deserving.  Princeton, NJ:  Princeton University Press, 1970.
    • The fourth chapter, on “Justice and Personal Desert,” is especially relevant.
  • Samuel Freeman, ed., The Cambridge Companion to Rawls.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 2003.
    • Like all the books in this series, this one offers a fine array of critical articles, with the one by Martha C. Nussbaum being particularly noteworthy.
  • John-Stewart Gordon, ed. Morality and Justice: Reading Boylan’s A Just Society. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2009.
    • 14 essays by scholars from 8 countries.  There is a reply by Boylan.
  • Richard Kraut, ed., Plato’s Republic:  Critical Essays.  Lanham, MD:  Rowman & Littlefield, 1997.
    • See, in particular, the articles by John M. Cooper and Kraut himself.
  • Rex Martin and David A. Reidy, ed., Rawls’s Law of Peoples.  Oxford:  Blackwell, 2006.
    • In particular, see “Do Rawls’s Two Theories of Justice Fit Together,” by Thomas Pogge.
  • David Miller, Principles of Social Justice.  Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 1999.
    • This is a good contemporary treatment.
  • David Fate Norton, ed., The Cambridge Companion to Hume.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1993.
    • See, especially, “The Structure of Hume’s Political Theory,” by Knud Haakonssen.
  • Thomas W. Pogge, Realizing Rawls.  Ithaca, NY:  Cornell University Press, 1989.
    • This is a constructive critique of Rawls’s early work.
  • Louis P. Pojman, Global Political Philosophy.  New York:  McGraw-Hill, 2003.
    • The fifth chapter focuses on justice.
  • Wayne P. Pomerleau, Twelve Great Philosophers.  New York:  Ardsley House, 1997.
    • This contains discussions of Plato, Aristotle, Augustine, Aquinas, Hobbes, Hume, Kant, Mill, and (a bit on) Rawls.
  • Tom Regan and Donald VanDeVeer, ed., And Justice for All.  Totowa, NJ:  Rowman and Littlefield, 1982).
    • An interesting collection, with a particularly penetrating article by Kai Nielsen.
  • Henry S. Richardson, “John Rawls (1921-2002),” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • This is a very good overview article.
  • Paul Ricoeur, The Just, trans. David Pellauer.  Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 2000.
    • This is interesting as a contemporary treatment from the continental tradition.
  • Allen D. Rosen, Kant’s Theory of Justice.  Ithaca:  Cornell University Press, 1993.
    • This is a valuable, in-depth analysis.
  • Alan Ryan, ed., Justice.  Oxford:  Oxford University Press, 1993.
    • This is a very good anthology of classical and contemporary readings.
  • Michael J. Sandel, ed., Justice:  A Reader.  New York:  Oxford University Press, 2007.
    • This is an interesting anthology of readings that includes Sandel’s own article on “Political Liberalism.”
  • Gerasimos Santas, Goodness and Justice.  Oxford:  Blackwell, 2001.
    • This is an in-depth examination of Socratic, Platonic, and Aristotelian views.
  • Amartya Sen, The Idea of Justice.  Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 2009.
    • This is a wide-ranging recent study.
  • John Skorupski, ed., The Cambridge Companion to Mill.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1998.
    • See, especially, “Mill’s Utilitarianism,” by Wendy Donner.
  • Robert C. Solomon and Mark C. Murphy, ed., What Is Justice?, Second Edition.  New York:  Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • This is a nice and well-organized collection of classical and contemporary texts.
  • James P. Sterba, The Demands of Justice.  Notre Dame:  University of Notre Dame Press, 1980.
    • This is a good monograph.
  • James P. Sterba, ed., Justice:  Alternative Political Perspectives, Fourth Edition.  Belmont, CA:  Wadsworth/Thomson, 2003.
    • This is a well-organized collection that includes a classic feminist critique of Rawls, taken from Justice, Gender and the Family, by Susan Okin.
  • Gregory Vlastos, ed., Plato:  A Collection of Critical Essays, Vol. II.  Garden City, NY:  Anchor Books, 1971.
    • See, especially, “Justice and Happiness in the Republic,” by Vlastos himself.
  • Michael Walzer, Just and Unjust Wars, Third Edition.  New York:  Basic Books, 2000.
    • This is an in-depth contemporary exploration of the topic.
  • Michael Walzer, Spheres of Justice.  New York:  Basic Books, 1983.
    • This is a comprehensive study.
  • Eric Thomas Weber, Rawls, Dewey and Constructivism:  On the Epistemology of Justice.  London:  Continuum, 2010.
    • This is a good recent comparative analysis.
  • Jonathan Westphal, ed., Justice.  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1996.
    • This is one of the best anthologies of classic texts on this subject.

Author Information

Wayne P. Pomerleau
Email: Pomerleau@calvin.gonzaga.edu
Gonzaga University
U. S. A.

Art and Emotion

It is widely thought that the capacity of artworks to arouse emotions in audiences is a perfectly natural and unproblemmatic fact. It just seems obvious that we can feel sadness or pity for fictional characters, fear at the view of threatening monsters on the movie screen, and joy upon listening to upbeat, happy songs. This may be why so many of us are consumers of art in the first place. Good art, many of us tend to think, should not leave us cold.

These common thoughts, however natural they are become problematic once we start to make explicit other common ideas about both emotion and our relationship with artworks. If some emotions, such as pity, require that the object of the emotion be believed to exist, even though it actually doesn’t, how would it then be possible to feel pity for a fictional character that we all know does not exist? A task of fundamental importance, therefore, is to explain the possibility of emotion in the context of our dealings with various kinds of artworks.

How are we motivated to pursue, and find value in, an emotional engagement with artworks when much of this includes affective states that we generally count as negative or even painful (fear, sadness, anger, and so on)? If we would rather avoid feeling these emotions in real life, how are we to explain cases where we pursue activities, such as watching films, that we know may arouse similar feelings? Alternatively, why are so many people eager to listen to seemingly deeply distressing musical works when they would not want to feel this way in other contexts? Are most of us guilty of irrational pleasure in liking what makes us feel bad? Answering these and related questions is of prime importance if we wish to vindicate the thought that emotion in response to art is not only a good thing to have, but also valuable in enabling us to appreciate artworks.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Emotion in Response to Representational Artworks: The Paradox of Fiction
    1. Denying the Fictional Emotions Condition
    2. Denying the Belief Condition
    3. Denying the Disbelief Condition: Illusion and Suspension of Disbelief
  3. Emotion in Response to Abstract Artworks: Music
    1. Moods, Idiosyncratic Responses and Surrogate Objects
    2. Emotions as Responses to Musical Expressiveness
      1. Music as Expression of the Composer’s Emotions
      2. Reacting Emotionally to Music’s Persona
      3. Contour Accounts of Expressiveness and Appropriate Emotions
    3. Music as Object
  4. Art and Negative Emotion: The Paradox of Tragedy
    1. Pleasure-Centered Solutions
      1. Negligible Pain
        1. Conversion
        2. Control
        3. No Essential Valence
      2. Compensation
        1. Intellectual Pleasure
        2. Meta-Response
        3. Catharsis
        4. Affective Mixture
    2. Non-Pleasure-Centered Solutions
      1. ‘Relief from Boredom’ and Rich Experience
      2. Pluralism about Reasons for Emotional Engagement
  5. The Rationality of Audience Emotion
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

That emotion is a central part of our dealings with artworks seems undeniable. Yet, natural ideas about emotion, at least taken collectively, make it hard to see why such an assumption should be true. Once we know a bit more about emotion, it isn’t clear how we could feel genuine emotion towards artworks in the first place. Furthermore, if it were possible to find a plausible theory of emotion that would vindicate the claim that we experience genuine emotion towards artworks, questions arise as to why most of us are motivated to engage in artworks, especially when these tend to produce negative emotions. How can the emotion we feel towards artworks be rationally justified? Overall, a proper understanding of our emotional responses to art should shed light on its value.

Although the general question of what an emotion consists in is highly debated, it is nonetheless possible to address a list of fairly uncontroversial general features of emotions that are most relevant to the present discussion.

Cognitive thesis: Emotions are cognitive states in the sense that they purport to be about things in the world. This means they require objects, they have intentionality, and they ascribe certain properties to them. For instance, fear can be thought to be attributed to an object’s dangerous nature or quality. Given that emotions are representational states, they are subject to norms of correctness. A case of fear is inappropriate if the object is not in fact dangerous or threatening. The nature of the relevant state─whether it is a judgment, a perception, or something else─is a matter of debate (see Deonna & Teroni, 2012, for an excellent introduction). Depending on the answer one gives on this issue, one’s views on the nature of our affective states towards artworks may differ.

Belief requirement: Even though emotions are probably not belief-states, they may always depend on beliefs for their existence and justification. One cannot, it seems, grieve over someone’s death if one doesn’t believe that they actually died. Or one cannot hope that it will be sunny tomorrow if one believes that the world is going to end tonight. More relevantly for the rest of the discussion, it may be difficult to make sense of why someone is genuinely afraid of something that does not exist.

Phenomenological thesis: Emotions are typically felt. There is something it is like to be experiencing an emotion; they are ‘qualitative’ states). Moreover, emotions are experienced with various levels of intensity. Sometimes it is possible to be in a situation where a given emotion is experienced at a high/low level of intensity where a higher/lower level is considered appropriate, suggesting that the correctness conditions of emotion should include a condition to the effect that the emotion is appropriately proportionate to its object.

Valence thesis: Emotions have valence or hedonic tone. Their phenomenology is such that some of them are experienced as negative and some as positive. Some emotion types seem to be essentially positive or negative. For example, fear, sadness, and pity are paradigmatic negative emotions, whereas joy and admiration are paradigmatic positive emotions.

All of these features, taken either individually or in combination, raise issues with respect to the alleged emotional relationship we entertain with artworks. Here are a couple of examples. The cognitive thesis and belief requirement make it difficult to see how our affective responses to things we believe to be non-existent, or to strings of meaningless (without representational content) sounds─as in instrumental music─could be genuine emotions. Alternatively, they require us to give a cogent account of the objects of the relevant emotions if these are to count as genuine. The valence thesis, combined with the plausible claim that ‘negative’ emotions are frequently felt in response to artworks, raise the question of how we can be motivated to pursue an engagement with artworks that we know are likely to arouse painful experiences in us. Finally, if the claims that we experience genuine emotions towards artworks, and that we are not irrational in seeking out unpleasant experiences, can be made good, the question whether these emotional responses themselves are rational, justified, or proportional remains to be answered.

2. Emotion in Response to Representational Artworks: The Paradox of Fiction

Artworks can be roughly divided into those that are representational and those that are non-representational or abstract. Examples of the former include works of fiction, landscape paintings and pop music songs. Examples of the latter include expressionist paintings and works of instrumental or absolute music. Both kinds of artworks are commonly thought to arouse affective responses in audiences. The basic question is how best to describe such responses.

Starting with representational artworks, it isn’t clear how we can undergo genuine emotional responses towards things we believe not to exist in the first place (creating a tension with the belief requirement above). Taking the case of fiction as a paradigm case, we seem to come to the following paradox (first formulated by Radford, 1975):

  1. We experience genuine emotions directed at fictional characters and situations (fictional emotions condition).
  2. In order to experience an emotion towards X, one must believe that X exists (belief requirement).
  3. We do not believe that fictional characters and situations exist (disbelief condition).

Claims (1)-(3) being inconsistent, most theorists have tried to solve the paradox of fiction by rejecting one or more of these premises.

a. Denying the Fictional Emotions Condition

The fictional emotions condition (claim (1)) can be denied in two main ways. On the one hand, one could deny that the affective states we experience in the context of an encounter with fiction are genuine emotions. On the other hand, accepting that the affective states in question are genuine emotions, one could deny that such mental states are in fact directed at fictional characters and situations.

Regardless of how the debate over the nature of our affective responses to fiction turns out, one thing is clear: we can be moved by an encounter with fiction. It is difficult to deny that works of fiction tend to affect us in some way or other. One solution to the paradox of fiction is therefore to claim that the relevant affective states need not be genuine emotions but affective states of some other kind (for example, Charlton, 1970, 97). Some affective states or moods (like cheerfulness) and, perhaps, reflex-like reactions (surprise and shock), do not seem to require existential beliefs in order to occur and are in fact compatible with the presence of beliefs with any given content. There is certainly no contradiction in a state of mind involving both a gloomy mood and the belief that the characters described in fiction are purely fictional. An advantage of this view is that it explains why the responses we have towards fiction are very much emotion-like. Moods, for instance, are not typically ‘cold’ mental states but have a phenomenal character.

The major difficulty with approaches appealing to such seemingly non-cognitive or non-intentional states is that they only seem to account for a small part of the full range of affective states we experience in response to fiction (Levinson, 1997, 23, Neill, 1991, 55). It is quite clear that many of the affective states we have in response to fiction are experienced as directed towards some object or other. One’s sadness upon seeing a story’s main character die is, at the very least, felt as directed towards someone, be it the character himself, a real-world analogue of himself (for instance, a best friend), or any other known reference. An adequate solution to the paradox of fiction, therefore, should allow the affective states one feels in response to fiction to be genuinely intentional.

Another solution that denies that we experience genuine emotions towards fictional characters is the one given by Kendal Walton (1978). According to Walton, it is not literally true that we experience pity for the fictional character Anna Karenina, and it is not literally true that we experience fear at the view of the approaching green slime on the movie screen. Rather, we are in some sense pretending to be experiencing such emotions. It is only fictionally the case that we feel pity or fear in such contexts. As a result, the affective states we actually experience are not genuine emotions, but what Walton calls ‘quasi-emotions’. Just as one makes-believe that the world is infested with heartless zombies when watching Night of the Living Dead, or that one is reading the diary of Robinson Crusoe, one only makes-believe that one feels fear for the survivors, or sadness when Crusoe is having a bad day. Watching films and reading novels turn out very much like children’s games where objects are make-believedly taken to be something else (for example, children pretend to bake cookies using cakes of mud). In engaging with both fiction and children’s games, for Walton, we can only be pretending to be experiencing emotion.

Walton does not deny that we are genuinely moved by─or emotionally involved with─the world of fiction; he only denies that such affective states are of the garden-variety, that they should be described as genuine states of fear, pity, anger, and so on. This denial is backed up by two main arguments. First, in contrast with real-life emotions, quasi-emotions are typically not connected to behavior. We, indeed, do not get up on the theater stage in order to warn Romeo that he is about to make a terrible mistake. Second, in line with the belief requirement, Walton appeals to what seems to him a “principle of commonsense”, “one which ought not to be abandoned if there is any reasonable alternative, that fear must be accompanied by, or must involve, a belief that one is in danger.” (1978, 6-7)

Walton’s theory can be attacked on several fronts, but the most common strategy is to reject one or both of the arguments Walton gives. In response to the first argument, one could argue that emotions in general are not necessarily connected to motivation or behavior. For instance, emotions directed at the past, such as regret, are not typically associated with any particular sort of behavior. Of course, emotions can lead to behavior, and many of them include a motivational component, but it is not clear that such a component is a defining feature of emotion in general. Moreover, it is important to note that most works of fiction are composed of representations of certain events, and do not purport to create the illusion that we are in direct confrontation with them. The most natural class of real-world emotions comparable to the relevant affective states, is therefore, emotions experienced towards representations of real-world states of affairs (documentaries and newspapers), and not in contexts of direct confrontation with the relevant objects. Once this distinction─between emotion in response to direct confrontation and emotion in response to representations of real-world events─is made, it becomes apparent that the lack of distinctive behavioral tendencies in affective states produced by fiction should not count against the claim that they constitute genuine emotions. Assuming the claim that it is possible to feel genuine pity, sadness or anger upon reading or hearing the report of a true story, the relevant emotions need not, and typically do not, include a motivational component whose aim is to modify the world in some way. One can read the story of a Jewish family deported in the 1940’s, feel deep sadness in response to it, yet lack the desires to act, as in sadness that is evoked in contexts of direct confrontation. (See Matravers, 1998, Ch. 4, for elaboration.)

The second argument, relying on (something like) the belief requirement, can be rejected by denying the requirement itself. A reason in favor of rejecting the belief requirement instead of the fictional emotions conditions is that rejecting the latter leads to a view with the highly revisionary consequence that it is never the case that we respond to fictions with genuine emotion. This sort of strategy will be introduced in Section 2.b.

If one accepts the claim that fiction can trigger genuine emotions in audiences, but nonetheless does not wish to reject either the belief requirement or the disbelief condition, one can deny that the relevant emotions are directed at fictional entities in the first place. An alternative way to describe our emotions in response to fiction is to say that, although such emotions are caused by fictional entities, they are not directed at them. As Gregory Currie summarizes what is sometimes called the ‘counterpart theory’ (defended in, for instance, Weston, 1975 and Paskins, 1977),

…we experience genuine emotions when we encounter fiction, but their relation to the story is causal rather than intentional; the story provokes thoughts about real people and situations, and these are the intentional objects of our emotions. (1990, 188)

Given that the objects of the relevant emotions─particular people and situations, types of people and situations, the fictional work itself, certain real-world properties inspired by the fictional characters, as well as real human potentialities (Mannison, 1985)─both exist and are believed to exist, the view satisfies the belief requirement. In addition, the view is compatible with the plausible claim that we do not believe in the existence of fictional characters and situations (that is, the disbelief condition). Appealing to surrogate objects is in fact a way to do justice to it.

Despite its elegance and simplicity, this solution to the paradox of fiction does not find a lot of proponents. It manages to capture some of the affective states, but not all. More specifically, the example of appealing to objectless affective states, fails to capture those affective states that are experienced as directed at the fictional characters and situations themselves. To many philosophers, it is simply a datum of the phenomenology of our responses to fiction that these are sometimes directed at the characters and situations themselves. It is precisely these responses that initially called for explanation.
"For we do not really weep for the pain that a real person might suffer”, says Colin Radford, “and which real persons have suffered, when we weep for Anna Karenina, even if we should not be moved by her story if it were not of that sort. We weep for her." (Radford, 1975, 75) An adequate theory of our emotional responses to fiction that appeals to surrogate objects, as a result, owes us an account of why we may be mistaken in thinking otherwise.

b. Denying the Belief Condition

The rejection of the claim that we can respond to fictional characters and situations with genuine emotions, and that such emotions can be genuinely directed at the latter, seems to clash with a rather stable commitment of commonsense. In recent years, the dominant approach has rather been to reject the belief requirement (claim (2)).

One reason why one might deny that the affective states we have in response to fiction are genuine emotions is an acceptance, explicit or implicit, of a certain theory of emotion. According to the so-called ‘cognitive’ theory of emotion (sometimes called ‘judgmentalism’), an emotion necessarily involves the belief or judgment that the object of the emotion instantiates a certain evaluative property (see examples in Lyons, 1980. Solomon, 1993). In this view, an episode of fear would necessarily involve the belief or judgment that one is in danger. This resembles the ‘principle of commonsense’ that Walton speaks of when he claims that “fear must be accompanied by, or must involve, a belief that one is in danger” (1978, 6-7). If emotions are, or necessarily involve, evaluative beliefs about the actual, it is no wonder that they require existential beliefs. The belief that a given big dog constitutes a threat, for instance, seems to entail the belief that the dog exists. Rejecting the cognitive theory, as a result, may seem to be a way to cast doubt on the belief requirement.

The cognitive theory of emotion is widely rejected for well-known reasons. One of them is the counterintuitive consequence that one would be guilty of a radical form of irrationality every time one’s emotions turn out to conflict with one’s judgments, as in cases of phobic fears (Tappolet, 2000, Döring, 2009). Another reason to reject the cognitive theory is that it may lead to the denial that human infants and non-human animals cannot experience emotions, since they plausibly lack the necessary level of cognitive sophistication (Deigh, 1994). Ultimately, many people seem to think, the theory is too ‘intellectualist’ to be plausible (Goldie, 2000, Robinson, 2005).

It is one thing to reject the cognitive theory of emotion, however, quite another to reject the belief requirement. Although the two views are closely related and are often held together (since the cognitive theory implies the belief requirement, at least understood as a requirement of rationality─see below), the falsity of the cognitive theory does not entail the falsity of the belief requirement. What the latter says is that, no matter how an emotion is to be ultimately defined, the having of one requires that the subject believe that its object exists. As Levinson says,

The sticking point of the paradox of fiction is the dimension of existence and nonexistence, as this connects to the cognitive characterization that emotions of the sort in question minimally require. When we view or conceive an object as having such and such properties, whether or not we strictly believe that it does, we must, on pain of incoherence, be taking said object to exist or be regarding it as existence. For nothing can coherently be viewed or conceived as having properties without at the same time being treated as existent. (1997, 24-25)

It is a mistake, therefore, to think that a simple rejection of the cognitive theory of emotion can solve the paradox of fiction. What one must do is confront the belief requirement directly.

The main way to challenge the belief requirement is to claim that, although our emotional responses to events in the world require the presence of some cognitive states, such states need not be beliefs. On such a view, sometimes called the “thought theory” (Lamarque, 1981, Carroll, 1990), one need not believe that an object O exists in order to be afraid of it; rather, one must at least entertain the thought that O exists (Carroll, 1990, 80), or imagine what O would be like if it existed (Novitz, 1980), or ‘alieve’ O being a certain way (see Gendler, 2008, for the distinction between alief and belief). We surely are capable of responding emotionally as a result of thought processes that fall short of belief, as when we are standing near a precipice and entertaining the thought that we may fall over (Carroll, 1990, 80. Robinson, 2005).

Thoughts, according to Lamarque and Carroll, can generate genuine emotions. On their view, the vivid imagining of one’s lover’s death can produce genuine sadness. It is important, however, to note that what the emotion is about─its intentional object─is not the thought itself, but what the thought is about (its ‘content’). In the case just given, one’s sadness is about one’s lover’s death, and not about the thought that one’s lover may die. Here, as in many everyday instances of emotion, the cause of one’s emotion need not coincide with its object, and the object of one’s emotion need not exist. As a result, the view preserves the claim that we can have genuine emotions directed towards fictional characters and situations.

Despite the fact that the thought theory (and its cognates─for example, Gendler’s view) enjoys a great deal of plausibility, in that it meshes quite well with recent orthodoxy in both the philosophy and the psychology of emotion in its claim that existential beliefs are not necessary for emotion in general (for a review, see Deonna & Teroni, 2012). It nonetheless appears to naturally lead to the claim that there is something utterly irrational, unreasonable, or otherwise wrong, in feeling fear, pity, joy, grief, and so on, both in response to mere thoughts, and for things that we know not to exist. If feeling pity for a fictional character is like feeling fear while imagining the possible crash of the plane one is taking (assuming flying the plane is a perfectly safe activity and one knows it), it becomes hard to see how one can be said to be rational in engaging emotionally with fiction, perhaps even to see where the value of doing so could lie. See Section 5 below.

When first presenting the paradox of fiction, Colin Radford decided to accept all the three premises of the alleged paradox and declared us ‘irrational’ in being moved by fiction. If one interprets the paradox as a logical paradox, that is as one in which the claims cannot all be true, then one would be led to the unpalatable thought that the world in itself includes some form of incoherence (Yanal, 1994). A more reasonable way to understand Radford’s decision to accept the three premises of the paradox, and in turn to declare us irrational, is to say that, as he understands them, they are not really inconsistent (they in fact can all be true). What interests Radford may not be so much how it is possible for audiences to feel emotions in response to fiction (although he must presuppose an answer to that question) than how it is possible for us to feel such emotions and be rational in doing so. An alternative way to read the belief requirement is, therefore, as a norm of rationality (Joyce, 2000). On such a reading, in order for an emotion to be fully appropriate or rational, it is necessary that the subject believe that the emotion’s object exists. A child’s fear of monsters in his bed at night may be irrational if the child does not believe that monsters in fact exist. Our emotional responses to fiction, although genuine, may be akin to such irrational fears of unreal entities.

It remains to be seen whether the belief requirement formulated as a norm of rationality (of a sort to be elucidated) is acceptable in the context of emotion in general, and in the context of emotion in response to artworks in particular. (See Section 5 below for further details.)

c. Denying the Disbelief Condition: Illusion and Suspension of Disbelief

Among all the strategies that have been adopted in response to the paradox of fiction, the least popular is the one that rejects the disbelief condition. There are two main ways to reject this condition.

The first way to reject the disbelief condition is to claim that, while watching films and reading novels, we are in some way under the illusion that the characters and situations depicted in them are real and we willfully suspend our disbelief in their existence (Coleridge, 1817), or simply forget, temporarily, that they do not exist.

The main problem with this solution is the notable behavioral differences between real-world responses and responses to fiction. If we were really suspending our disbelief we would behave differently than we actually do in our dealings with fictions. Another problem is the notion that we can suspend our disbelief at will in the context of fiction, seems to presuppose a capacity of voluntary control over our beliefs in the face of opposing evidence - a claim that surely needs a proper defense. See Doxastic Voluntarism, and Carroll, 1990, Ch.2, for further discussion. Finally, it may be partly due to the fact that we are aware that we are dealing with fiction that we can find pleasure, or some worth, in experiencing negative emotions towards fictional entities in the first place. (See section on Art and Negative Emotion: The Paradox of Tragedy.)

Currie (1990, 10) provides an alternative understanding of the notion of willful suspension of disbelief whereby it is occurrent, as opposed to dispositional disbelief that should be suppressed. What suspension of disbelief requires, for Currie, is merely that one, while engaged in a work of fiction, does not attend to the fact that the story is literally false. On such a view, a proper engagement with fictional stories, while allowing one to believe at some level that these stories are non-actual requires that one not bring this belief to consciousness. This solution, however, remains rather sketchy and may need to be supplemented with further details about the workings of the relevant mechanism. See Todd, forthcoming, for a proposal (in particular for the notion of bracketed beliefs).

The second way to reject the disbelief condition is by arguing that in some sense we do actually believe what the relevant stories tell us (rather than merely suspend our disbelief in the reality of their content), and therefore that the characters at play in them exist in some way. A plausible way to do so is to say that beliefs need not be directed at propositions about the actual and sometimes can be directed at propositions about what is fictionally the case. For instance, there does not seem to be anything wrong with the utterance “I believe that Sherlock Holmes lives in London”, and with the possibility of a genuine disagreement between the speaker and someone who believes that Holmes lives in Manchester. The fact that the relevant states are about a fictional entity does not give us a reason to deny them the status of beliefs. According to Alex Neill (1993), many of the types of emotion (pity, for example) we experience in response to fiction, require the presence of certain beliefs while leaving open the ontological status (actual vs. non-actual) of the entities involved in its content. On this account, what matters for pity, for instance, is not that a given character is believed to have actually existed, but that she is having a miserable time (in the fiction).

Whether an appeal to belief (as opposed to an appeal to make-beliefs, imaginings, attention mechanisms, and so on.) is the right way to capture the phenomenon is open for debate. Still, this solution not only seems to accommodate some of our intuitions, but also prompts us to further investigate the nature of the kinds of belief, if any, found in the context of an engagement with works of fiction. See Suits (2006) for further discussion.

3. Emotion in Response to Abstract Artworks: Music

Representational artworks are not the only ones capable of eliciting affective states in audiences; non-representational artworks can do so, too. One surely can be moved by a Beethoven’s Fifth Symphony or a Jackson Pollock’s No.5, 1948. A problem analogous to the problem of fiction can however be found in the case of abstract art. How can it be the case that we are moved by strings of sounds, or configurations of colors, when such entities do not represent anything, strictly speaking? Here, the question of what is the object of the relevant emotions is even more pressing than for fiction, as in this case there seems to be no characters and situations for an emotion to be about. Focusing on the case of (instrumental or absolute) music, two main questions should therefore be addressed. First, how should we classify our affective responses to music? Second, if such affective responses can be genuine emotions, what are their objects?

a. Moods, Idiosyncratic Responses and Surrogate Objects

As in the case of fiction, there are affective responses to music that may not pose any substantial philosophical problem. Such responses include seemingly non-cognitive or non-intentional states such as moods and feelings. Since moods are not directed at anything in particular, and can be triggered by a variety of things, including events, thoughts, and even certain chemical substances (such as caffeine), they do not constitute a problem in the context of our dealings with musical works. However, can genuine emotions be experienced in response to music? Intuitively, the answer is ‘of course’. The problem is precisely what kinds of emotion these can be and towards what they can be directed.

Some cases of genuine emotion in response to music that do not seem to be philosophically significant, moreover, are those emotions that we experience in response to music which can be explained by idiosyncratic facts about the subject. This is what Peter Kivy calls the ‘our-song phenomenon’ (Kivy, 1999, 4). A piece of music, for instance, may bring to one a host of memories that produce sadness. Here, as elsewhere, the intentional object of the emotion turns out not to be the music itself but what the memories are about (a lost love, say). Such cases are not philosophically puzzling, therefore, because they involve emotions whose object is not (or at least not exclusively) the music or the music’s properties.

Alternatively, one may fear that the loudness of a performance of Vivaldi’s Four Seasons might cause severe auditory damage. In such a case, although the music is the object of the emotion, the emotion is not in any way aesthetically relevant. It is not a response that is made appropriate by the music’s aesthetic properties. Furthermore, it is not a response that everyone is expected to experience in response to Vivaldi’s piece, as opposed to the particular performance of it in a specific context. (By analogy, one may be angry at the sight of a stain on the frame of the Mona Lisa; this, however, does not make anger an appropriate response to the painting as an object of aesthetic appraisal.)

What we need to know is whether there are cases of emotion that can claim to be aesthetically relevant in this intuitive way.

b. Emotions as Responses to Musical Expressiveness

It is commonly thought that musical works can be ‘sad’, ‘happy’, ‘melancholy’, perhaps even ‘angry’. In short, music appears capable of expressing, or being expressive of, emotions. One line of thought is that, just as we can respond to human expressions of emotion with genuine emotions, we can respond to music’s expressive properties with genuine emotions. In the case of human expressions of emotion, one can for instance react to someone’s sadness with genuine sadness, pity, or anger, the person (or the person’s distress) being the intentional object of one’s emotion. Likewise, if music can express sadness, one may respond to it by being sad (Davies, 1994, 279), something that seems to accord with common experience. The problem, of course, is in what sense music can be said to ‘express’ emotion in a way that would cause appropriate corresponding emotions in audiences. (The addition of the word ‘appropriate’ here is important, as one could agree that the relevant properties sometimes cause emotion─just as any (concrete) object can happen to cause emotion─but nonetheless consider them irrelevant to a proper appreciation of the work. For the view that all emotion elicited by musical works is pure distraction, see Zangwill, 2004.)

Of course, it is one thing to ask what musical expressiveness consists in; it is another thing to wonder about the nature of our affective response to musical works. One question addresses what makes it the case that a piece of music can be said to be ‘sad’, ‘joyful’ or ‘melancholy’, the other asks what makes it the case that we can feel emotions, if any, in response to a piece of music. As a result, nothing prevents one from answering these questions separately. Nevertheless, the various answers one might give to the question about musical expressiveness plausibly can have implications regarding the nature and appropriateness of our emotional responses to music’s expressive properties. If, for instance, the answer we give is that music can express emotions in roughly the same way humans do, then we are likely to count experiences of sadness in response to ‘sad’ music as appropriate. If, by contrast, we take the answer to be that music is expressive in an analogous way colors and masks can be expressive, we are likely to consider the affective states the relevant features tend to trigger either inappropriate (when feeling sadness directed at a work’s ‘sadness’) or of a sort that we don’t typically find in our responses to paradigmatic expression of human emotion.

Let’s call the claim according to which it is appropriate to react emotionally to music’s expressive properties in an analogous way it is appropriate to react emotionally to the expression of other people’s emotions, the expression-emotion link thesis (E), and the sorts of responses we typically (and appropriately) experience in response to the expression of human emotions─such as pity, sadness, compassion, or sympathy when someone is in a state of distress─‘empathetic emotions’. Accounts of musical expressiveness divide into those that naturally lead to the acceptance of (E) and those that naturally lead to its rejection (and perhaps to the denial that empathetic emotions are ever really felt in the context of an engagement with musical works).

i. Music as Expression of the Composer’s Emotions

The most obvious way to do justice to the thought that music’s expressiveness can appropriately arouse in its audience emotions that are analogous to those one would feel in response to a real person expressing her emotions is to say that music itself is a medium by which human emotions can express themselves. Music, on one such view, can express the emotions of the composer. So, if when we listen to music we listen to what we take to be the direct expression of the emotions of some real human being, then the usual emotions we can feel towards someone expressing emotion through facial expression, gestures, voice, and so on, are emotions we can feel in response to music. One problematic feature of this view is the highly robust link it makes between the mental states of the artist and the expressive properties of the music he or she produces. Little reflection suggests that it is just not true that whenever a musical work is ‘cheerful’, its composer was cheerful when composing it; a sad composer could have created the work just as well. Moreover, the view does not seem to do justice to our experience of musical works, as we typically do not, and need not, construe them as expressions of human emotion in order to be moved by them; our experience of musical works does not typically go beyond the sounds themselves, and probably not to the artist who produced them.

ii. Reacting Emotionally to Music’s Persona

One way to preserve the attractive thought that music can genuinely express emotions, and therefore that it may sometimes be appropriate to respond to it with empathetic emotions, is to claim that music can express emotion, not by virtue of it being produced by an artist experiencing emotion, but imagined as something or someone that expresses emotion. According to Jerrold Levinson (1990), when we listen to music that is expressive of emotion, we hear it as though someone─what he calls the music’s ‘persona’─were expressing the emotion of the music. Of course, the persona is not something that is or ought to be imagined in great detail; for instance, there is no need to attribute any specific physical characteristics to it. All that is needed is that something very much human-like be imagined as expressing human-like emotions. Now, if Levinson is right in claiming that music’s expressive properties are to be explained by an appeal to a persona that we imagine to be in the music, then there is less mystery in the possibility for audiences to experience genuine emotions in response to these properties. At the very least, there may be here as much mystery as in our ability to experience genuine emotions in response to the expression of emotion by fictional characters, and the solution one gives to the paradox of fiction may as a result be expandable so as to include the case of music. See Kivy, 2002, 116-117, for doubts about this strategy.

iii. Contour Accounts of Expressiveness and Appropriate Emotions

Regardless of the appeal of its conclusions, the persona theory relies on a psychological mechanism─imagining hearing a persona in the music─whose nature may need to be further clarified (see Davies, 1997, for problems for the persona account). An account of music’s expressive properties that posits no seemingly mysterious mechanism, and therefore that may seem less controversial, is what is sometimes called the ‘contour’ or ‘resemblance’ theory (examples can be found in Davies, 1994, Kivy, 1989). According to this view, music can be expressive of emotion in virtue of resembling characteristic expressions of human emotion, a resemblance that we seem pretty good at picking out. A heavy, slow-paced piece of music may, for instance, resemble the way a sad, depressed person would walk and behave, and it may be why we are tempted to call it ‘sad’ or ‘depressing’ in the first place. Musical works, on such a view, are analogous to colors, masks, and other things that we may call ‘happy’, ‘sad’, and so on, on the basis of their perceptible properties. A ‘happy’ song is similar to a smiling mask in that they both resemble in some way characteristic behavioral expressions of human emotion.

The contour theorist does not claim that music genuinely expresses emotion in the way that paradigmatically humans do (that is, by first experiencing an emotion, and then expressing it); rather, she claims that music can resemble expressions of human emotion, just as certain other objects can. Given that musical expressiveness is, on this view, different from paradigmatic human expression, we are led to conclude one of two claims: either the emotions we typically experience in response to music’s expressive properties are generally not of the same sort as the emotions we typically experience in response to other people’s expressions of emotion, or, whenever they are, they are inappropriate. The former claim is a descriptive claim about the nature of our emotional responses to music’s expressive properties; the latter claim is a normative claim about the sorts of responses music’s expressive properties require, if any. We will consider the descriptive claim in the next section.

Why does the contour theory naturally lead to the normative claim? The answer is that, just as it would be inappropriate to feel ‘empathetic’ emotions in response to the sadness of a mask or the cheerfulness of a color, it would be inappropriate to feel such emotions in response to the sadness, or the cheerfulness, of a piece of music. Unless we believe that what one is sad about when looking at a mask is not really the mask, we should be puzzled by one’s response, for, after all, nobody is (actually or fictionally) sad. (Of course, the mask may produce certain moods in one; this, however, would not constitute a problem, as we have seen.) The sadness, as a result, would count as an inappropriate response to its object.

Something similar may hold in the music case. Although there may be cases where sadness is an appropriate response to a musical work’s ‘sadness’ (for idiosyncratic reasons), this may not be a response that is aesthetically appropriate, that is, appropriate given the work’s aesthetic properties. No matter how often we respond emotionally to music’s expressive properties, these ultimately may count as mere distractions (Zangwill, 2004).

The plausibility of the contour account remains to be assessed. See Robinson, 2005, Ch. 10, for a critique. See also Neill, 1995, for the possibility of a positive role for feelings in attaining a deeper understanding of music’s expressiveness.

c. Music as Object

According to Peter Kivy (1990, 1999), there is an obvious object that can produce genuine emotions in audiences, namely the music itself. On his view, in addition to moods (with qualifications─see Kivy, 2006) and idiosyncratic emotions (the our-song phenomenon), music is capable of eliciting emotions in audiences that are both genuine (not ‘quasi-emotions’), aesthetically appropriate, and of the non-empathetic sort. When one is deeply moved by a musical work, one may be moved by its beauty, complexity, subtlety, grace, and any other properties predicated by the work (including its expressive properties, construed in terms of the contour account). According to Kivy, these emotions, which can collectively be put under the label ‘being moved’, are the only ones that count as appropriate in the relevant way. Moreover, they are not the ‘empathetic’ responses that were put forward in the aforementioned accounts. When we are moved by ‘sad’ music, what may move us is how beautifully, or gracefully the music is expressive of sadness, rather than by an alleged persona we may pity. This allows Kivy to explain why we can (rightly) fail to be moved by a musical work that is surely expressive of some emotion but is at the same time mediocre, a phenomenon that is left unexplained on alternative accounts (Kivy, 1999, 12). In addition, the account explains how music can be moving even when it lacks expressive properties altogether (ibid.).

According to Kivy, we are simply mistaken when thinking that whenever we experience a genuine emotion in response to a musical work, this emotion is of the same sort as the emotions we would feel in response to the expression of emotion in other people. It is simply not true, on his account, that music’s sadness produces in audiences a state of sadness (or other empathetic emotions) whose intentional object is its expressive property (or the entity, real or imagined, that allegedly produced it). What they feel instead is an emotion that, although directed at the music’s sadness, should not be characterized as sadness but instead as ‘exhilaration’, ‘wonder’, ‘awe’, ‘enthusiasm’, and other non-empathetic emotions. Even if the emotion is felt in response to music’s sadness, and may on occasion even feel like garden-variety empathetic emotions, Kivy states that first appearances may be deceptive.

Whether Kivy’s solution to the original problem (including his rejection of (E)), and its accompanying error theory, are adequate, is a matter of significant debate. (In any case, all parties may agree that it adequately captures some emotions that we can confidently count as appropriate responses to music.)

4. Art and Negative Emotion: The Paradox of Tragedy

Let’s assume that we regularly experience genuine emotions in response to fictional characters and situations, and that among the emotions we commonly experience are paradigmatic ‘negative’ emotions. (If one thinks that music can arouse such emotions as well, the following problem is a problem about music, too.) Now, to the extent that many of us are inclined to regularly pursue an engagement with works of fiction, and thereby things that tend to produce negative emotions in audiences, we have a problem in explaining how many of us could be motivated in pursuing activities that elicit in us such unpleasant states.

The paradox of tragedy (called the ‘paradox of horror’ in the specific context of horror─Carroll, 1990) arises when the three following theses are held simultaneously:

  1. We commonly do not pursue activities that elicit negative emotions.
  2. We often have negative emotions in response to fictional works.
  3. We commonly pursue an engagement with fictional works that we know will elicit negative emotions.

Notice that the so-called ‘paradox’ is not a formal paradox. Unless one defends a strong form of motivational hedonism─namely, the view that all we are motivated to pursue is pleasure and nothing else; see Hedonism─the fact that many of us pursue activities that produce painful experiences is not logically problematic. Rather, the problem is that of explaining why many of us are so eager to seek out an engagement with works of fiction when they know it will result in negative emotions and negative emotions are things they generally wish to avoid (all other things being equal). Alternatively, there is a problem in explaining the presence of the relevant motivation in the context of fiction when such motivation is arguably lacking in everyday life.

The solutions to the paradox of tragedy can be divided into two broad classes: those that appeal to pleasure in solving the paradox and those that appeal to entities other than pleasure.

a. Pleasure-Centered Solutions

A common way to characterize the paradox of tragedy is by asking how we can derive pleasure from artworks that tend to elicit unpleasant states in its audience. One solution is to say that the pain that may result from an engagement with fictional works is relatively insignificant or negligible. Another solution is to say that, although the pain that may result in such an engagement can be significant, it is nonetheless compensated by pleasure derived from either the work or some other source.

i. Negligible Pain

1. Conversion

Various mechanisms have been postulated in the history of philosophy in order to explain how we can sometimes derive pleasure from activities, such as watching tragedies and horror films, that tend to elicit unpleasant experiences in audiences. David Hume provides one such mechanism in his famous essay ‘Of Tragedy’. According to Hume, unpleasant emotional experiences are ‘converted’ into pleasant ones in response to positive aesthetic properties of the work such as the eloquence with which the events of the narrative are depicted. One’s overall initially unpleasant emotional state is thereby converted into a pleasant emotional state thanks to the ‘predominance’ of a positive emotion.

One of the main problems with this proposal is the absence of a clear account of the mechanism by which such conversion is made (Feagin, 1983, 95). Presumably, part of the initial overall experience─the pain─is removed and replaced by another part─the pleasure. This, however, demands explanation as to how such an operation can be performed. If the operation is not that there is first a negative emotion and thereafter a positive emotion that somehow compensates for the first’s unpleasantness (which would make Hume’s view a variant of the ‘compensation’ solution; see below), then what is it precisely?

Another problem with the conversion theory is that it seems to fail to allow for cases where people are motivated to engage with works of fiction that they know will on the whole lead to more pain than pleasure, but that may still provide them with some valuable experience (Smuts, 2007, 64). (See section on Non-Pleasure-Centered Solutions below.)

2. Control

Hume’s theory is meant to account for the possibility of deriving pleasure from an engagement with fictional works eliciting negative emotions. This view assumes that we do tend to experience unpleasant emotions in response to fiction; it is just that the unpleasant part of the emotions is modified in the course of the engagement so as to make the overall experience a pleasant one.

An alternative way to view our engagement with works of fiction is as in fact rarely involving any significantly unpleasant states in the first place. On a recent family of solutions, it is a fact of life that we are able to enjoy, under certain conditions, putative ‘negative’ emotions. According to one version of this solution, the ‘control theory’ (Eaton, 1982, Morreall, 1985), the relevant conditions are those where we enjoy some suitable degree of control over the situation to which we are attending. The thought is that, whenever we think that the situation is one over which we can have a fair degree of control, the negative emotions that we may feel in response to it would be felt as less painful than they would otherwise be. For instance, the fear that a professional mountain climber, a skydiver, a roller-coaster user, or a horror film lover, may feel, may be painful to such an insignificant extent that it may turn out to be enjoyable. The reason why the relevant experiences are enjoyable, on this view, is that the subjects are confident that they can handle the situation appropriately. In the fictional case, one can certainly leave the movie theater, or close the book, at any time, and therefore stop being confronted with the work, whenever it becomes unbearable (for example, when it depicts extreme violence).

One worry with the present solution is that, in its current form at least, it still leaves it rather mysterious why we are able to derive pleasure from even mildly unpleasant affective states. The control theorist does not deny that the relevant emotions are to some degree unpleasant. The problem is that she fails to provide us with an account as to why we would want to have such experiences in the first place. What’s so enjoyable about feeling a little pain? As Aaron Smuts puts it, “If we feel any pain at all, then the question of why we desire such experiences, why we seek out painful art, is still open.” (Smuts, 2007, 66)

Another worry is that the view may not have the resources to explain why some people, and not others, pursue activities that tend to elicit unpleasant experiences, when everyone enjoys the relevant control (Gaut, 1993, 338). The fact that people have some control over their responses may well be a prerequisite for the possibility of finding pleasure in them, but it does not seem to explain why such pleasure is to be had in the first place. As alternatively put, although confidence that one will have the capacity to exercise some degree of control may be necessary in order to have the relevant motivation, it is surely insufficient. The control theory therefore requires further elaboration.

3. No Essential Valence

One way to solve the paradox of tragedy by relying on the idea that we can enjoy negative emotions is by denying an assumption that was made when we initially posed the problem, namely that the ‘negative’ emotions we feel in response to fiction are necessarily unpleasant states (Walton, 1990, Neill, 1993). One problem with control theories, we saw, is that they fail to explain why we should even enjoy mild instances of pain. The present solution, by contrast, does not claim that the emotions we experience involve any such pain. More generally, the view denies that emotion as such essentially involves valence (as in the valence thesis above). According to Kendall Walton and Alex Neill, when responding emotionally to an undesirable situation, we may confuse the undesirability of the situation with the perceived nature of the emotion, thereby thinking that it is the emotion that is unpleasant. “What is clearly disagreeable”, Walton says, “what we regret, are the things we are sorrowful about –the loss of an opportunity, the death of a friend─not the feeling or experience of sorrow itself.” (Walton, 1990, 257) Neill goes a step further, making the claim that what we actually mean when we say that an emotion is painful or unpleasant, is that an emotion in these terms is in fact attributing the relevant properties (painfulness, unpleasantness, and so on) to the situations themselves (Neill, 1992, 62).

The major problem for such a view, of course, is that it seems to radically run counter to common sense in holding that emotions do not in themselves feel good or bad. There certainly appears to be a fairly robust conceptual connection between certain emotion types and felt qualities that can be described as pleasure and pain. Perhaps, however, one could maintain that, although such a conceptual connection exists, it is not so strong as to rule out exceptions. For such a possibility, see Gaut, 1993.

ii. Compensation

The second class of solutions that appeal to pleasure, in solving the paradox of tragedy, take the pain involved in our engagement with fiction to be genuine, sometimes even significant, but take this pain to be compensated by some pleasure experienced in response to either the work or some other source.

1. Intellectual Pleasure

One general solution to the paradox of tragedy is to say that, although works of fiction can surely elicit unpleasant states in audiences, they can also elicit pleasant ones. An explanation for why we are motivated to engage with such works is that they usually elicit states that are on the whole more pleasant than unpleasant.

A version of this solution is the one defended by Noel Carroll in his book on horror (Carroll, 1990). Carroll argues that monsters, such as vampires and werewolves, often violate our categorial schemes. In doing so, they unsurprisingly can look threatening, scary, and disgusting, explaining in turn why we can experience emotions such as fear and disgust towards them. However, in challenging our categorial schemes, monsters can also trigger our curiosity. Monsters are indeed things that fascinate us. According to Carroll, the pleasure that is derived from our getting to know more about them can compensate for the unpleasant states we may initially experience, particularly when the narration is such as to arouse our curiosity. The pain is for Carroll “the price to be paid for the pleasure of [the monsters’] disclosure” (1990, 184).

One problem with Carroll’s view is that not all horror stories involve monsters, that is, things that challenge our categorial schemes in the way that werewolves do. Psychopaths and serial killers, for instance, do not seem to be monsters in this sense; they are, as Berys Gaut says, “instances of an all-too-real phenomenon” (Gaut, 1993, 334). Carroll, however, could give up his appeal to monsters in particular, and claim rather that the relevant characters in the horror genre have the ability to elicit our curiosity and the resulting intellectual pleasures.

A more serious problem is that Carroll’s explanation does not seem to be adequate when we go beyond the particular case of horror. The fact that we enjoy watching drama films does not seem to be explainable solely in terms of our curiosity and fascination for odd characters. One possible response to this worry is that intellectual pleasures need not be derived from the satisfaction of our curiosity, and that such pleasures can rather be derived from a variety of sources, including things that do not elicit our curiosity. One problem with this solution would be why the relevant pleasures should be exclusively intellectual, rather than (say) both intellectual and affective. (See Affective Mixture.) In addition, the proponent of this solution may need to motivate the thought that it is in virtue of the pleasures they produce that the relevant intellectual states (such as learning about the characters) are valuable to us, as opposed to the fact that such states are intrinsically valuable. Why should it be the pleasure that one has as a result of learning about the personality of a work’s characters that is the primary motivating factor in our engaging with fiction? Why can it not be the fact that one, say, is able to get a new perspective on what it is to be human, regardless of whether the painful experiences that one may undergo are compensated by pleasant ones? (See Non-Pleasure-Centered Solutions.)

2. Meta-Response

Susan Feagin (1983), another proponent of the compensatory solution, argues that we are motivated to engage with works of fiction that elicit negative emotions, not because the works themselves elicit pleasant experiences in greater proportion, but because of certain responses that we have towards the negative emotions themselves. In a nutshell, for Feagin, an awareness of the fact that we are the kind of people to experience, for instance, pity for Anna Karenina, results in a pleasurable state that compensates for the painful emotions that we have. It feels good, on this view, to realize that we care about the right things.

This solution suffers from a number of problems. First, it does not appear to be applicable to all the relevant cases, such as horror fictions. Many works of horror fiction certainly do not involve ‘sympathetic’ emotions such as pity, and involve rather fear and disgust. Furthermore, it doesn’t seem right to say that, when we experience fear and disgust in response to horror, we enjoy the fact that we are the kind of people to feel fear and disgust.

A second problem with Feagin’s view concerns its appeal to the notion of a meta-response. One thing to notice is that it does not sit well with the phenomenology of our engagement with many fictions. When watching a movie involving a serial killer, our attention is mostly focused on the events depicted, and rarely on ourselves; when we feel sad for an innocent character that has been killed, we do not seem to be sad for her and enjoy being the kind of person who can be sad for innocent people who have been murdered. Such a thought, it seems, rarely occurs to us. Of course, such self-congratulatory thoughts may occur, and may sometimes contribute to one’s overall enjoyment of the work, but they don’t seem necessary for it to be the case that one enjoys fictional works that elicit unpleasant experiences.

3. Catharsis

On one popular understanding of Aristotle’s famous theory of catharsis (see Lucas, 1928), the major motivation behind our desire to watch tragedy is that, by experiencing negative emotions, we are in turn able to expel them (by letting them go away), which somehow provides us with a pleasurable state. It is not, on such a view, the negative emotions that are pleasurable, but the fact that, after having been experienced, they are purged.

One issue this solution fails to address is that the pleasure that one derives from the experience of an unpleasant state terminated (as when one stops having a toothache after taking medicine) compensates for the unpleasantness of the state one was initially in. Moreover, the proponent of the catharsis solution must tell us why the relief that one gets from the extinction of the painful experiences is what typically motivates us in pursuing an engagement with the relevant fictional works. The fact that one will suffer for some time but then be ‘healed’ in a way that is very pleasant hardly sounds like a reason for one to accept to undergo the suffering in the first place. (For further reading, see Smuts, 2009, 50-51.)

Perhaps Aristotle meant to capture a different phenomenon by appealing to the notion of purgation, however. For instance, he could have taken purgation to involve emotions that people unconsciously had before engaging with the work, and that the work would help express themselves, leading to a pleasurable ‘release’ of some inner tension. Despite its possible intuitive appeal, such a solution remains to be developed in a clear and convincing way. (See Aristotle: Poetics for further details.)

4. Affective Mixture

The final pleasure-centered compensatory view that is worth mentioning holds that it does not really matter what kind of experience is supposed to compensate for the pain involved in the negative emotions; what is important is that there be some such experience. For instance, the negative emotions that we feel in response to a drama may be compensated by the joy we experience in realizing that it has a happy ending. Relief may often play a role as well, as when we are relieved that the main character is not going to die after all, something we were afraid would happen throughout the movie or novel.

The view, moreover, does not deny that something like the purgation of certain negative emotions may sometimes elicit pleasurable states. As Patricia Greenspan, a defender of this view, says, “it is not the release of fear that is pleasurable, at least in immediate terms, but that fact that one is soon released from it.” (1988, 32) However, the view denies that this is the only way painful states can be compensated. Such states can be compensated by any positive affective state that is called for by the work: joy, relief, a pleasant sense of immunity, the pleasure of having had a meaningful experience, admiration, and perhaps even self-congratulatory meta-responses. What matters, on this view, is the fact that some pleasant state or other is sufficiently strong to compensate for any unpleasant state the audience may otherwise have.

One advantage of the view is that it readily explains why people sometimes have to close the book they’re reading, or leave the movie theater: they have reached a point where the unpleasant emotions they experience have attained such a level of intensity that they don’t think the work could in any way compensate for them. In addition, the account has a straightforward explanation of why some of us do not like genres, such as horror, that tend to elicit negative emotions in audiences: the positive experiences they have, if any, do not typically compensate for the negative ones.

Another advantage of the present account is its ability to be applied to a wide range of cases, from horror and tragedy to drama and soap opera. Given that it allows a variety of mental states to play the compensatory role, it is less vulnerable to counter-examples.

The main problem with such a view, as with all pleasure-centered views, is simply that not all works of fiction that we are motivated to engage with succeed in compensating for the unpleasant states they elicit in the relevant way and may even leave us utterly depressed or disturbed. For example, Albert Camus’ The Stranger does not seem to elicit many pleasant experiences in readers, at any rate none that are likely to compensate for the pain elicited; many people who fully know what to expect may nevertheless be motivated to read it, suggesting that pleasure is not always what we are trying to get when pursuing an engagement with works of fiction. Pleasure may not be the only thing that negative emotions can buy.

b. Non-Pleasure-Centered Solutions

According to recent proposals, we beg the question if we assume that the paradox of tragedy asks us to explain how we can take pleasure in response to artworks eliciting negative responses in audiences. Unless we are committed to a form of motivational hedonism according to which nothing other than pleasure can account for the pervasiveness of the motivation to engage with works of fiction eliciting negative emotions, the question arises as to whether some other factor(s) may play the relevant motivating role.

We may sometimes find ourselves in conflict between going to see a movie that, although depressing, may teach us some valuable lessons about life, and doing some less painful activity (such as watching comedy). If we end up choosing to see the depressing movie, it is clearly not because one is hoping that it will give one more pleasure than pain. The pain may indeed be the cost of gaining something of value, regardless of whether the having of that thing turns out to be pleasurable.

Below are examples of theories that do not take pleasure to be the main, or the only, factor that explains our willingness to engage with works of fiction eliciting negative emotions. Notice that they can be viewed as compensatory theories that do not primarily appeal to pleasure.

i. ‘Relief from Boredom’ and Rich Experience

A clear example of the kind of view under discussion is one that Hume introduces and rejects in his essay on tragedy, and that he attributes to L’Abbé Dubos. According to Dubos, the thing that we most want when we pursue an engagement with tragedy is a ‘relief from boredom’. As life can sometimes be dull, he thinks, we may find it better to feel any emotion, even negative ones, as long as it delivers us from our boredom.

Dubos’ view is attractive for a number of reasons. First, it is very simple in that it explains the motivation we have to engage with tragedy by appealing to a single overarching desire: the desire to avoid boredom. Second, it makes it possible for people to pursue an engagement with works of fiction that they know will not elicit positive experiences that would compensate for the negative ones.

Of course, it is doubtful that a desire to avoid boredom is actually the underlying motivation behind all engagements with tragedy. Even if Dubos’ proposal does not work, it still provides a recipe for constructing a number of plausible views. If the desire to avoid boredom is not the relevant overarching desire, this does not mean that there is no such desire to be found. For instance, it could be the case that the relevant desire is the desire to have meaningful experiences, whatever their specific nature. According to a recent proposal (Smuts, 2007), when we engage in works of fiction such as tragedies and horror films, what we essentially desire is to get a ‘rich’ experience out of it. This experience, moreover, can be provided by a variety of mental states, including learning about certain characters, having our desire to avoid boredom fulfilled, having a sense of security (since, after all, the events depicted in fictional works are not real), feeling alive, and any other valuable mental state that can be had in the context of an encounter with the work. In addition, such mental states need not be particularly pleasant ones, as when one is being made aware of certain nasty truths about human nature.

One might wonder why there is a focus on experience here, in addition to what the notion of experience at play here is supposed to amount to. It is perfectly conceivable that some consumers of painful fiction are motivated to engage with it for non-experiential reasons. It is not the fact that they will have valuable experiences per se that may motivate them, but the fact that they will acquire certain valuable states whose phenomenology need not be experienced as intrinsically valuable. For instance, one can be reluctant to learn sad truths about the world via literature, but nonetheless pursue this activity because the relevant knowledge is valuable in its own right. Of course, the acquisition of the relevant knowledge may be experienced as meaningful or valuable, but it may not be what one ultimately pursues. One possible response from the rich response theorist is that, by and large, people (or, perhaps, people who are motivated by distinctively aesthetic or artistic considerations) are predominantly motivated to pursue an engagement with artworks eliciting unpleasant emotions because they will provide them with some valuable experience. This, however, would prevent the rich experience theorist from generalizing her account to all cases of painful activities that we are motivated in pursuing. (See next section.)

ii. Pluralism about Reasons for Emotional Engagement

An alternative way to solve the paradox of tragedy is not by appealing to an overarching desire, though such a desire may ultimately exist, but to simply accept that there are many motivating reasons for which we pursue an engagement with the relevant fictions. Like the rich experience theory, such a pluralist solution does not deny that pleasure may sometimes be a motivating factor. What matters however is that we expect from an engagement with any particular work of fiction more benefits than costs, benefits that can be realized by a variety of things: knowledge (including ‘sad truths’), a sense of being alive, an avoidance of boredom, an appreciation of aesthetic properties—any value that can be gained from an interaction with the relevant work. Pluralism about the reasons motivating our engagement with tragedy, therefore, differs from the rich experience theory in that it remains non-committal regarding the existence of an overarching desire under which all these reasons may fall.

The pluralist solution, notably, not only explains why we are motivated to engage with works of fiction that elicit negative emotions in audiences, it also seems to have the resources to provide an explanation for why we are motivated to pursue any activity that tends to elicit negative emotions. Why are some motivated to practice bungee jumping, mountain climbing, fasting, and any other activity that one can think of and that involves displeasure to some non-negligible extent? Because, presumably, it has some positive value that compensates for the displeasure that one may experience, positive value that need not be realized by pleasure. In contrast to the rich experience theory, furthermore, the pluralist solution does not place any constraint on the kind of thing whose positive value may compensate for the displeasure we may experience in the relevant contexts; it indeed does not even have to be a mental state. This is partly what makes an extension of the pluralist solution possible. To take a mundane case, getting one’s wisdom teeth removed may be valuable, and therefore something we may be motivated to pursue, despite the unpleasant side-effects, not merely because one will have pleasurable or other valuable experiences in the future, but partly because doing so contributes positively to one’s health.

Whether the paradox of tragedy may ultimately be part of a broader phenomenon, and, if so, whether it should nonetheless be solved in a way that is special to it, are matters for further discussion.

5. The Rationality of Audience Emotion

As hinted at in our discussion of the paradox of fiction, it is one thing to establish that we are capable of experiencing genuine emotions in response to fictional characters and situations (and perhaps in response to expressive properties of musical works, depending on one’s view on the matter); it is quite another thing to establish that such responses are rational. Colin Radford, let’s recall, attempted to solve the paradox by declaring us irrational in experiencing the relevant emotions. After all, for him, since there is nothing to be afraid, sad, or angry about, having such emotions in the context of an encounter with fictional characters cannot be as rational as having them in the context of an encounter with real people. If our emotions in response to artworks fall short of being fully rational, the worry therefore goes, it becomes hard to see where their apparent value could really lie. Are our emotional responses to fiction in any way justifiable?

Let’s distinguish two broad kinds of justification that emotions can be thought to have. On the one hand, emotions can be epistemically justified in the sense that they give us an accurate representation of the world; the fact that emotions can be rational in this way (at least in principle) is a straightforward consequence of their being cognitive or representational states. On the other hand, emotions can be justified by non-epistemic reasons. For instance, a given instance of anger, with its characteristic expressions, can turn out to be useful in scaring potential threats away.

Presumably, when Radford declared us ‘irrational’ in experiencing emotions in response to entities that we believe do not exist, he meant that there is something epistemically wrong with them. By analogy, there is arguably something wrong from an epistemological standpoint with someone who is afraid of a harmless spider precisely because the spider does not constitute a real threat.

One way to deny that emotions in response to fiction (and representational artworks generally) are irrational in the relevant sense is by saying that the epistemic norms to which they ought to comply are in some way different from those at play in the case of belief. Whereas it would be wrong to believe that there is such a person as Sherlock Holmes after having read Conan Doyle’s novels, it may nonetheless be epistemically acceptable to experience admiration for him. The difference between the epistemic norms governing belief and those governing emotion may lie in the fact that those governing the latter put a lower threshold on what counts as adequate evidence than those governing the former. (See Greenspan, 1988, and Gilmore, 2011, for discussion.)

It seems plausible that some emotions at least are epistemically appropriate responses to the content of fictional stories. In many cases, emotions seem required for a proper appreciation and understanding of the work. Reading War and Peace without experiencing any emotion whatsoever hardly makes possible the kind of understanding that is expected of the reader. Furthermore, it appears quite intuitive to say that, without emotion, an appreciation of the aesthetic qualities of certain artworks, such as those possessed by their narrative structure, would be at best highly impoverished. Radford could reply however that such emotions are uncontroversial, as they are directed at properties of the work rather than at its fictional content. The problem with this response is that even such emotions may need to rely on prior emotions that have been directed at the content of the work.

Even if the emotions we experience in response to fictional artworks are epistemically irrational, they still may be rational in respects that are not epistemic. The point of departure of such a claim is that there is a sense in which the relevant emotions are not completely irrational; they sometimes make perfect sense. As a result, perhaps their value lies in their enabling us to achieve either non-epistemic goods or knowledge about the actual world (as opposed to some putative fictional world). An example of a non-epistemic good may be what can be roughly called spiritual growth. It is commonly thought that literature can somehow educate its audience, not by giving it information about the world, but by playing with its emotions in a way that is beneficial. It seems certainly right that fictions, by presenting us novel situations, can condition our emotions by making us feel what we would not have in real-life situations. Moreover, fiction may enable its audiences to experience empathetic emotions towards types of characters (and their situations) of which they may have no significant knowledge prior to the engagement with the work, contributing potentially to certain openness to the unknown. (It is worth noting that this may provide an additional reason to favor the non-pleasure-centered solutions to the paradox of tragedy introduced above.) Additionally, given the capacity of fictions to modify our emotional repertoire, thereby potentially modifying our values, some philosophers have emphasized the genuine possibility of acquiring moral knowledge by means of an engagement with fiction. See Nussbaum, 1992, for a discussion on the ways literature can contribute to moral development.

It is worth pointing out dangers that are commonly thought to be at play in the fact that we regularly engage emotionally with fictional entities. Certain works of fiction, for instance, such as some works of drama, are designed to arouse very intense emotional responses in audiences. Some of us may feel that there is something wrong, indeed highly sentimental, with indulging in such activities. Perhaps this is because of a norm of proportionality that is at play in our judgment; perhaps this is because of another norm. In any case, sentimentality is often taken to be a bad thing. See Tanner, 1976, for a classic discussion.

In addition to sentimentality, one may worry that works of fiction have the ability to arouse in audiences ‘sympathetic’ feelings for morally problematic characters (see Feagin, 1983), and perhaps in the long run be detrimental to one’s moral character. Whether this is true, however, is an empirical question that cannot be answered from the armchair.

Whether or not the experience of emotions in response to artworks is on the whole rational remains a very live question, a question that, given the irresistible thought that artworks are valuable partly because of the emotional effect they have on us, is of prime importance. (See Matravers, 2006, for further discussion.)

6. Conclusion

There are at least three main problems that arise at the intersection of emotions and the arts. The first problem is that of explaining how it is possible to experience genuine emotions in response to fictional events and non-representational strings of sounds. The second problem is finding a rationale for our putative desire to engage with works of art that systematically trigger negative affective states in us (regardless of whether such states count as genuine emotions). Assuming the claim that works of art do sometimes trigger genuine emotions in us, the third problem is the problem whether the relevant responses can be said to be rational (given that, after all, they are systematically directed at non-existent or non-meaningful entities). We have seen that each of these problems admits more or less plausible answers that may require a revision of our pre-theoretical beliefs about emotion, on the one hand, and artworks, on the other. Whether a non-revisionary solution to each of these problems is possible, and whether its lack of non-revisionary implications would give this solution the upper hand over alternative solutions, are questions the reader is encouraged to consider.

It is worth emphasizing that the list of problems this article deals with is far from exhaustive. One promising avenue of research is the thorough study of the relationship between emotions and other mental capacities, including imagination. Of particular interest in this area is the phenomenon of imaginative resistance whereby an audience is reluctant to imaginatively engage with fictional works that require them to imagine situations that run contrary to its moral beliefs (such as a world where the torture of innocents is morally permissible). Given that imaginative resistance plausibly implies the presence of certain emotions, such as indignation and guilt, and the absence of others, such as joy and pride, we can legitimately ask what is the precise relationship between our reluctance to imagine certain states of affairs and the emotional responses that are often found to accompany this reluctance (see, for instance, Moran, 1994). If emotion turned out to play a role in the explanation of imaginative resistance in response to fiction, this would give us strong ground for taking the relationship between emotion, fiction, and morality very seriously.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Budd, M. (1985). Music and the Emotions. Routledge
    • A forceful attack of the major theories on the relationship between music and emotion.
  • Carroll, N. (1990). The Philosophy of Horror. New York: Routledge
    • A classic discussion on the nature of our responses to horror films.
  • Charlton, W. (1970). Aesthetics. London: Hutchinson
    • Dated but useful introduction to aesthetics.
  • Coleridge, S.T. ([1817] 1985). Biographia Literaria, ed. Engell, J. & Bate, W.J. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Currie, G. (1990). The Nature of Fiction. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
    • A classic treatment of the nature of fiction. Includes a chapter on the paradox of fiction.
  • Davies, S. (1994). Musical Meaning and Expression. Ithaca: Cornell University Press
    • Important contribution to the debate over the nature of musical expressiveness.
  • Davies, S. (1997). “Contra the Hypothetical Persona in Music”, in Hjort, M. & Laver, S. (eds.), Emotion and the Arts. New York: Oxford University press. 95-109
    • A forceful attack on the persona theory of musical expressiveness.
  • Deigh, J. (1994). “Cognitivism in the Theory of Emotions”, Ethics, 104, 824-854
    • A classic critique of the cognitive theory of emotion.
  • Deonna, J.A. & Teroni, F. (2012). The Emotions: A Philosophical Introduction. New York: Routledge
    • An excellent introduction to the philosophy of emotion.
  • Döring, S. (2009). “The Logic of Emotional Experience: Non-Inferentiality and the Problem of Conflict Without Contradiction”, Emotion Review, 1, 240-247
    • An article where a problem to the cognitive theory of emotion is exposed.
  • Eaton, M. (1982). “A Strange Kind of Sadness”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 41, 51-63
    • A response to the paradox of tragedy appealing to control.
  • Feagin, S. (1983). “The Pleasures of Tragedy”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 20, 95-104
    • Develops a response to the paradox of tragedy in terms of meta-response.
  • Gaut, B. (1993). “The Paradox of Horror”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 33, 333-345
    • A thorough response to Noel Carroll’s treatment of our responses to works of horror.
  • Gendler, T.S. (2008). “Alief and Belief”, Journal of Philosophy, 105, 10, 634-663
    • Article where the distinction between alief and belief is defended and developed.
  • Gendler, T.S. & Kovakovich, K. (2006). “Genuine Rational Fictional Emotions”, in Kieran, M. (ed.), Contemporary Debates in Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art. Blackwell. 241-253
    • An article dealing with the paradox of fiction. Argues that our responses to fictional works are rational.
  • Gilmore, J. (2011). “Aptness of Emotions for Fictions and Imaginings”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 92, 4, 468-489
    • An article dealing with the topic of appropriateness of emotions in fictional and imaginative contexts.
  • Goldie, P. (2000). The Emotions: A Philosophical Exploration. Oxford: Oxford University Press
    • A classic text in the philosophy of emotion. Defends the claim that the cognitive theory of emotions is too ‘intellectualist’.
  • Greenspan, P. (1988). Emotions and Reasons. New York: Routledge
    • Explores the relationship between emotions and rationality.
  • Hjort, M. & Laver, S. (eds.) (1997). Emotion and the Arts. New York: Oxford University Press
    • An excellent collection of papers on the relationship between emotions and artworks.
  • Joyce, R. (2000). “Rational Fears of Monsters”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 21, 291-304
    • An article construing the paradox of fiction as a paradox of rationality rather than logic.
  • Kivy, P. (1989). Sound Sentiment: An Essay on the Musical Emotions. Philadelphia: Temple University Press
    • Classic contribution to the philosophy of music, in particular to the topic of emotions in music.
  • Kivy, P. (1990). Music Alone: Philosophical Reflections on the Purely Musical Experience. Ithaca: Cornell University Press
    • Classic contribution to the philosophy of music. Revival of formalism in music theory.
  • Kivy, P. (1999). “Feeling the Musical Emotions”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 39, 1-13
    • An article expressing clearly Kivy’s views on the relationship between music and emotion.
  • Kivy, P. (2002). Introduction to a Philosophy of Music. Oxford: Oxford University Press
    • A good introduction to the philosophy of music, and to Kivy’s views on it.
  • Kivy, P. (2006). “Mood and Music: Some Reflections on Noël Carroll”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 64, 2, 271-281
    • A good place to find Kivy’s views on moods in response to music.
  • Lamarque, P. (1981). “How Can We Fear and Pity Fictions”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 21, 291-304
    • Classic article developing the thought theory as a response to the paradox of fiction.
  • Levinson, J. (1990). Music, Art, and Metaphysics: Essays in Philosophical Aesthetics. Ithaca: Cornell University Press
    • A classic book in analytic aesthetics. Includes a chapter on music and negative emotion.
  • Levinson, J. (1997). “Emotion in Response to Art: A Survey of the Terrain”, in Hjort, M. & Laver, S. (eds.), Emotion and the Arts. New York: Oxford University press. 20-34
    • A short and useful survey of the various questions and positions about our emotional responses to artworks. Could be used as a supplement to the present article.
  • Lucas, F.L. (1928). Tragedy in Relation to Aristotle’s Poetics. Hogarth
    • Classic treatment of Aristotle’s view on tragedy. Defines catharsis as moral purification.
  • Lyons, W. (1980). Emotion. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
    • A classic exposition of the cognitive theory of emotion.
  • Mannison, D. (1985). “On Being Moved By Fiction”, Philosophy, 60, 71-87
    • Article on the paradox of fiction. Develops a solution appealing to surrogate objects.
  • Matravers, D. (1998). Art and Emotion. Oxford: Oxford University Press
    • A comprehensive study of the relationship between emotion and art.
  • Matravers, D. (2006). “The Challenge of Irrationalism, and How Not To Meet It”, in Kieran, M. (ed.), Contemporary Debates in Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art. Blackwell. 254-264
    • An interesting discussion on the rationality and value of emotions in response to works of fiction.
  • Moran, R. (1994). “The Expression of Feeling in Imagination”, Philosophical Review, 103, 1, 75-106
    • Classic article on imagination and the emotions.
  • Morreall, J. (1985). “Enjoying Negative Emotions in Fiction”, Philosophy and Literature, 9, 95-103
    • A response to the paradox of tragedy appealing to control.
  • Neill, A. (1991). “Fear, Fiction and Make-Believe”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 49, 1, 47-56
    • Provides a good discussion of the notion of make-believe.
  • Neill, A. (1992). “On a Paradox of the Heart”, Philosophical Studies, 65, 53-65
    • A critical discussion of Carroll’s solution to the paradox of horror.
  • Neill, A. (1993). “Fiction and the Emotions”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 30, 1-13
    • Proposes a solution to the paradox of fiction in terms of beliefs about what is fictionally the case.
  • Novitz, D. (1980). “Fiction, Imagination, and Emotion”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 38, 279-288
    • Develops a version of the ‘thought’ theory in terms of imagination.
  • Nussbaum, M.C. (1992). Love’s Knowledge: Essays on Philosophy and Literature. Oxford: Oxford University Press
    • Classic text at the intersection of philosophy and literature. Provides a defense of the claim according to which literature can play a positive role in moral philosophy.
  • Paskins, B. (1977). “On Being Moved by Anna Karenina and Anna Karenina”, Philosophy, 52, 344-347
    • Article on the paradox of fiction. Provides a solution in terms of surrogate objects.
  • Radford, C. (1975). “How Can We Be Moved by the Fate of Anna Karenina?”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, supplementary vol. 49, 67-80
    • The classic article where Radford introduces the so-called ‘paradox of fiction’.
  • Radford, C. (1989). “Emotions and Music: A Reply to the Cognitivists”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 47, 1, 69-76
    • Article on emotion and music. Responds to views assuming the cognitive theory of emotion (such as Kivy’s).
  • Ridley, A. (1995). Music, Value, and the Passions. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press
    • A thorough study of the relationship between music and emotion. Defense of the claim that the emotions we feel in response to music can positively contribute to a proper understanding of it.
  • Robinson, J. (2005). Deeper than Reason: Emotion and its Role in Literature, Music, and Art. New York: Oxford University Press
    • A comprehensive treatment of the relationship between emotions and artworks. A very good discussion on the nature of emotions included.
  • Smuts, A. (2007). “The Paradox of Painful Art”, Journal of Aesthetic Education, 41, 3, 59-77
    • Excellent discussion on the paradox of tragedy. Puts forward the rich experience theory.
  • Smuts, A. (2009). “Art and Negative Affect”, Philosophy Compass, 4, 1, 39-55
    • Excellent introduction to the paradox of tragedy. Good supplement to the present article.
  • Suits, D.B. (2006). “Really Believing in Fiction”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 87, 369-386
    • Article on the paradox of fiction. Argues that, while engaging with fictional stories, we do believe in their content.
  • Solomon, R. (1993). The Passions: Emotions and the Meaning of Life. Indianapolis: Hackett
    • Classic text in the philosophy of emotion. Develops a cognitive account of emotion.
  • Tappolet, C. (2000). Emotions et valeurs. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France
    • Classic defense of the perceptual theory of emotion (in French).
  • Todd, C. (forthcoming). “Attending Emotionally to Fiction”, Journal of Value Inquiry
    • Article on the paradox of fiction. Proposes a solution appealing to the notion of bracketed beliefs. A plausible version of the suspension of disbelief strategy.
  • Walton, K.L. (1978). “Fearing Fictions”, Journal of Philosophy, 75, 5-27
    • Classic paper on the paradox of fiction. Introduction of the notion of quasi-emotion.
  • Walton, K.L. (1990). Mimesis as Make-Believe. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press
    • Classic text on the nature of our engagement with fictions.
  • Walton, K.L. (1997). “Spelunking, Simulation, and Slime: On Being Moved by Fiction”, in Hjort, M. & Laver, S. (eds.), Emotion and the Arts. New York: Oxford University press. 37-49
    • Article on the paradox of fiction. Worth comparing with Walton’s earlier formulation of his views on the matter.
  • Weston, P (1975). “How Can We Be Moved by the Fate of Anna Karenina? II.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, supplementary vol. 49, 81-93
    • Article on the paradox of fiction. Provides a solution in terms of surrogate objects.
  • Yanal, R.J. (1994). “The Paradox of Emotion and Fiction”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 75, 54-75
    • A good article for an introduction to the paradox of fiction.
  • Zangwill, N. (2004). “Against Emotion: Hanslick Was Rightbout Music”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 44, 29-43
    • A thorough defense of the view that emotions are aesthetically inappropriate in an engagement with musical works.

Author Information

Hichem Naar
Email: hm.naar@gmail.com
University of Manchester
United Kingdom


The word “argument” can be used to designate a dispute or a fight, or it can be used more technically. The focus of this article is on understanding an argument as a collection of truth-bearers (that is, the things that bear truth and falsity, or are true and false) some of which are offered as reasons for one of them, the conclusion. This article takes propositions rather than sentences or statements or utterances to be the primary truth bearers. The reasons offered within the argument are called “premises”, and the proposition that the premises are offered for is called the “conclusion”. This sense of “argument” diverges not only from the above sense of a dispute or fight but also from the formal logician’s sense according to which an argument is merely a list of statements, one of which is designated as the conclusion and the rest of which are designated as premises regardless of whether the premises are offered as reasons for believing the conclusion. Arguments, as understood in this article, are the subject of study in critical thinking and informal logic courses in which students usually learn, among other things, how to identify, reconstruct, and evaluate arguments given outside the classroom.

Arguments, in this sense, are typically distinguished from both implications and inferences. In asserting that a proposition P implies proposition Q, one does not thereby offer P as a reason for Q. The proposition frogs are mammals implies that frogs are not reptiles, but it is problematic to offer the former as a reason for believing the latter. If an arguer offers an argument in order to persuade an audience that the conclusion is true, then it is plausible to think that the arguer is inviting the audience to make an inference from the argument’s premises to its conclusion. However, an inference is a form of reasoning, and as such it is distinct from an argument in the sense of a collection of propositions (some of which are offered as reasons for the conclusion). One might plausibly think that a person S infers Q from P just in case S comes to believe Q because S believes that P is true and because S believes that the truth of P justifies belief that Q. But this movement of mind from P to Q is something different from the argument composed of just P and Q.

The characterization of argument in the first paragraph requires development since there are forms of reasoning such as explanations which are not typically regarded as arguments even though (explanatory) reasons are offered for a proposition. Two principal approaches to fine-tuning this first-step characterization of arguments are what may be called the structural and pragmatic approaches. The pragmatic approach is motivated by the view that the nature of an argument cannot be completely captured in terms of its structure. In what follows, each approach is described, and criticism is briefly entertained.  Along the way, distinctive features of arguments are highlighted that seemingly must be accounted for by any plausible characterization. The classification of arguments as deductive, inductive, and conductive is discussed in section 3.

Table of Contents

  1. The Structural Approach to Characterizing Arguments
  2. The Pragmatic Approach to Characterizing Arguments
  3. Deductive, Inductive, and Conductive Arguments
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Structural Approach to Characterizing Arguments

Not any group of propositions qualifies as an argument. The starting point for structural approaches is the thesis that the premises of an argument are reasons offered in support of its conclusion (for example, Govier 2010, p.1, Bassham, G., W. Irwin, H. Nardone, J. Wallace 2005, p.30, Copi and Cohen 2005, p.7; for discussion, see Johnson 2000, p.146ff ). Accordingly, a collection of propositions lacks the structure of an argument unless there is a reasoner who puts forward some as reasons in support of one of them. Letting P1, P2, P3, …, and C range over propositions and R over reasoners, a structural characterization of argument takes the following form.

 A collection of propositions, P1, …, Pn, C, is an argument if and only if there is a reasoner R who puts forward the Pi as reasons in support of C.

The structure of an argument is not a function of the syntactic and semantic features of the propositions that compose it. Rather, it is imposed on these propositions by the intentions of a reasoner to use some as support for one of them. Typically in presenting an argument, a reasoner will use expressions to flag the intended structural components of her argument. Typical premise indicators include: “because”, “since”, “for”, and “as”; typical conclusion indicators include “therefore”, “thus”, “hence”, and “so”. Note well: these expressions do not always function in these ways, and so their mere use does not necessitate the presence of an argument.

Different accounts of the nature of the intended support offered by the premises for the conclusion in an argument generate different structural characterizations of arguments (for discussion see Hitchcock 2007). Plausibly, if a reasoner R puts forward premises in support of a conclusion C, then (i)-(iii) obtain. (i) The premises represent R’s reasons for believing that the conclusion is true and R thinks that her belief in the truth of the premises is justified. (ii) R believes that the premises make C more probable than not. (iii) (a) R believes that the premises are independent of C ( that is, R thinks that her reasons for the premises do not include belief that C is true), and (b) R believes that the premises are relevant to establishing that C is true. If we judge that a reasoner R presents an argument as defined above, then by the lights of (i)-(iii) we believe that R believes that the premises justify belief in the truth of the conclusion.  In what immediately follows, examples are given to explicate (i)-(iii).

A: John is an only child.

B: John is not an only child; he said that Mary is his sister.

If B presents an argument, then the following obtain. (i) B believes that the premise ( that is, Mary is John’s sister) is true, B thinks this belief is justified, and the premise is B’s reason for maintaining the conclusion. (ii) B believes that John said that Mary is his sister makes it more likely than not that John is not an only child, and (iii) B thinks that that John said that Mary is his sister is both independent of the proposition that Mary is John’s sister and relevant to confirming it.

A: The Democrats and Republicans don’t seem willing to compromise.

B: If the Democrats and Republicans are not willing to compromise, then the U.S. will go over the fiscal cliff.

B’s assertion of a conditional does not require that B believe either the antecedent or consequent. Therefore, it is unlikely that B puts forward the Democrats and Republicans are not willing to compromise as a reason in support of the U.S. will go over the fiscal cliff, because it is unlikely that B believes either proposition. Hence, it is unlikely that B’s response to A has the structure of an argument, because (i) is not satisfied.

A: Doctor B, what is the reason for my uncle’s muscular weakness?

B: The results of the test are in. Even though few syphilis patients get paresis, we suspect that the reason for your uncle’s paresis is the syphilis he suffered from 10 years ago.

Dr. B offers reasons that explain why A’s uncle has paresis. It is unreasonable to think that B believes that the uncle’s being a syphilis victim makes it more likely than not that he has paresis, since B admits that having syphilis does not make it more likely than not that someone has (or will have) paresis. So, B’s response does not contain an argument, because (ii) is not satisfied.

A: I don’t think that Bill will be at the party tonight.

B: Bill will be at the party, because Bill will be at the party.

Suppose that B believes that Bill will be at the party. Trivially, the truth of this proposition makes it more likely than not that he will be at the party. Nevertheless, B is not presenting an argument.  B’s response does not have the structure of an argument, because (iiia) is not satisfied. Clearly, B does not offer a reason for Bill will be at the party that is independent of this. Perhaps, B’s response is intended to communicate her confidence that Bill will be at the party. By (iiia), a reasoner R puts forward [1] Sasha Obama has a sibling in support of [2] Sasha is not an only child only if R’s reasons for believing [1] do not include R’s belief that [2] is true. If R puts forward [1] in support of [2] and, say, erroneously believes that the former is independent of the latter, then R’s argument would be defective by virtue of being circular. Regarding (iiib), that Obama is U.S. President entails that the earth is the third planet from the sun or it isn’t, but it is plausible to suppose that the former does not support the latter because it is irrelevant to showing that the earth is the third planet from the sun or it isn’t is true.

Premises offered in support of a conclusion are either linked or convergent. This difference marks a structural distinction between arguments.

[1] Tom is happy only if he is playing guitar.
[2] Tom is not playing guitar.
[3] Tom is not happy.

Suppose that a reasoner R offers [1] and [2] as reasons in support of [3]. The argument is presented in what is called standard form; the premises are listed first and a solid line separates them from the conclusion, which is prefaced by “”. This symbol means “therefore”. Premises [1] and [2] are linked because they do not support the conclusion independently of one another,  that is, they support the conclusion jointly. It is unreasonable to think that R offers [1] and [2] individually, as opposed to collectively, as reasons for [3]. The following representation of the argument depicts the linkage of the premises.


Combining [1] and [2] with the plus sign and underscoring them indicates that they are linked. The arrow indicates that they are offered in support of [3]. To see a display of convergent premises, consider the following.

[1] Tom said that he didn’t go to Samantha’s party.
[2] No one at Samantha’s party saw Tom there.
[3] Tom did not attend Samantha’s party.

These premises are convergent, because each is a reason that supports [3] independently of the other. The below diagram represents this.


An extended argument is an argument with at least one premise that a reasoner attempts to support explicitly. Extended arguments are more structurally complex than ones that are not extended. Consider the following.

The keys are either in the kitchen or the bedroom. The keys are not in the kitchen. I did not find the keys in the kitchen. So, the keys must be in the bedroom. Let’s look there!

The argument in standard form may be portrayed as follows:

[1] I just searched the kitchen and I did not find the keys.
[2] The keys are not in the kitchen.
[3] The keys are either in the kitchen or the bedroom.
[4] The keys are in the bedroom.


Note that although the keys being in the bedroom is a reason for the imperative, “Let’s look there!” (given the desirability of finding the keys), this proposition is not “truth apt” and so is not a component of the argument.

An enthymeme is an argument which is presented with at least one component that is suppressed.

A: I don’t know what to believe regarding the morality of abortion.

B: You should believe that abortion is immoral. You’re a Catholic.

That B puts forward [1] A is a Catholic in support of [2] A should believe that abortion is immoral suggests that B implicitly puts forward [3] all Catholics should believe that abortion is immoral in support of [2]. Proposition [3] may plausibly be regarded as a suppressed premise of B’s argument. Note that [2] and [3] are linked. A premise that is suppressed is never a reason for a conclusion independent of another explicitly offered for that conclusion.

There are two main criticisms of structural characterizations of arguments. One criticism is that they are too weak because they turn non-arguments such as explanations into arguments.

A: Why did this metal expand?

B: It was heated and all metals expand when heated.

B offers explanatory reasons for the explanandum (what is explained): this metal expanded. It is plausible to see B offering these explanatory reasons in support of the explanandum. The reasons B offers jointly support the truth of the explanandum, and thereby show that the expansion of the metal was to be expected. It is in this way that B’s reasons enable A to understand why the metal expanded.

The second criticism is that structural characterizations are too strong. They rule out as arguments what intuitively seem to be arguments.

A: Kelly maintains that no explanation is an argument. I don’t know what to believe.

B: Neither do I. One reason for her view may be that the primary function of arguments, unlike explanations, is persuasion. But I am not sure that this is the primary function of arguments. We should investigate this further.

B offers a reason, [1] the primary function of arguments, unlike explanations, is persuasion, for the thesis [2] no explanation is an argument. Since B asserts neither [1] nor [2], B does not put forward [1] in support of [2]. Hence, by the above account, B’s reasoning does not qualify as an argument. A contrary view is that arguments can be used in ways other than showing that their conclusions are true. For example, arguments can be constructed for purposes of inquiry and as such can be used to investigate a hypothesis by seeing what reasons might be given to support a given proposition (see Meiland 1989 and Johnson and Blair 2006, p.10). Such arguments are sometimes referred to as exploratory arguments.  On this approach, it is plausible to think that B constructs an exploratory argument [exercise for the reader: identify B’s suppressed premise].

Briefly, in defense of the structuralist account of arguments one response to the first criticism is to bite the bullet and follow those who think that at least some explanations qualify as arguments (see Thomas 1986 who argues that all explanations are arguments). Given that there are exploratory arguments, the second criticism motivates either liberalizing the concept of support that premises may provide for a conclusion (so that, for example, B may be understood as offering [1] in support of [2]) or dropping the notion of support all together in the structural characterization of arguments (for example, a collection of propositions is an argument if and only if a reasoner offers some as reasons for one of them. See Sinnott-Armstrong and Fogelin 2010, p.3).

2. The Pragmatic Approach to Characterizing Arguments

The pragmatic approach is motivated by the view that the nature of an argument cannot be completely captured in terms of its structure. In contrast to structural definitions of arguments, pragmatic definitions appeal to the function of arguments. Different accounts of the purposes arguments serve generate different pragmatic definitions of arguments. The following pragmatic definition appeals to the use of arguments as tools of rational persuasion (for definitions of argument that make such an appeal, see Johnson 2000, p. 168; Walton 1996, p. 18ff; Hitchcock 2007, p.105ff)

A collection of propositions is an argument if and only if there is a reasoner R who puts forward some of them (the premises) as reasons in support of one of them (the conclusion) in order to rationally persuade an audience of the truth of the conclusion.

One advantage of this definition over the previously given structural one is that it offers an explanation why arguments have the structure they do. In order to rationally persuade an audience of the truth of a proposition, one must offer reasons in support of that proposition. The appeal to rational persuasion is necessary to distinguish arguments from other forms of persuasion such as threats. One question that arises is: What obligations does a reasoner incur by virtue of offering supporting reasons for a conclusion in order to rationally persuade an audience of the conclusion? One might think that such a reasoner should be open to criticisms and obligated to respond to them persuasively (See Johnson 2000 p.144 et al, for development of this idea). By appealing to the aims that arguments serve, pragmatic definitions highlight the acts of presenting an argument in addition to the arguments themselves. The field of argumentation, an interdisciplinary field that includes rhetoric, informal logic, psychology, and cognitive science, highlights acts of presenting arguments and their contexts as topics for investigation that inform our understanding of arguments (see Houtlosser 2001 for discussion of the different perspectives of argument offered by different fields).

For example, the acts of explaining and arguing—in sense highlighted here—have different aims.  Whereas the act of explaining is designed to increase the audience’s comprehension, the act of arguing is aimed at enhancing the acceptability of a standpoint. This difference in aim makes sense of the fact that in presenting an argument the reasoner believes that her standpoint is not yet acceptable to her audience, but in presenting an explanation the reasoner knows or believes that the explanandum is already accepted by her audience (See van Eemeren and Grootendorst 1992, p.29, and Snoeck Henkemans 2001, p.232). These observations about the acts of explaining and arguing motivate the above pragmatic definition of an argument and suggest that arguments and explanations are distinct things. It is generally accepted that the same line of reasoning can function as an explanation in one dialogical context and as an argument in another (see Groarke and Tindale 2004, p. 23ff for an example and discussion). Eemeren van, Grootendorst, and Snoeck Henkemans 2002 delivers a substantive account of how the evaluation of various types of arguments turns on considerations pertaining to the dialogical contexts within which they are presented and discussed.

Note that, since the pragmatic definition appeals to the structure of propositions in characterizing arguments, it inherits the criticisms of structural definitions. In addition, the question arises whether it captures the variety of purposes arguments may serve. It has been urged that arguments can aim at engendering any one of a full range of attitudes towards their conclusions (for example, Pinto 1991). For example, a reasoner can offer premises for a conclusion C in order to get her audience to withhold assent from C, suspect that C is true, believe that is merely possible that C is true, or to be afraid that C is true.

The thought here is that these are alternatives to convincing an audience of the truth of C. A proponent of a pragmatic definition of argument may grant that there are uses of arguments not accounted for by her definition, and propose that the definition is stipulative. But then a case needs to be made why theorizing about arguments from a pragmatic approach should be anchored to such a definition when it does not reflect all legitimate uses of arguments. Another line of criticism of the pragmatic approach is its rejecting that arguments themselves have a function (Goodwin 2007) and arguing that the function of persuasion should be assigned to the dialogical contexts in which arguments take place (Doury 2011).

3. Deductive, Inductive, and Conductive Arguments

Arguments are commonly classified as deductive or inductive (for example, Copi, I. and C. Cohen 2005, Sinnott-Armstrong and Fogelin 2010). A deductive argument is an argument that an arguer puts forward as valid. For a valid argument, it is not possible for the premises to be true with the conclusion false. That is, necessarily if the premises are true, then the conclusion is true. Thus we may say that the truth of the premises in a valid argument guarantees that the conclusion is also true. The following is an example of a valid argument: Tom is happy only if the Tigers win, the Tigers lost; therefore, Tom is definitely not happy.

A step-by-step derivation of the conclusion of a valid argument from its premises is called a proof. In the context of a proof, the given premises of an argument may be viewed as initial premises. The propositions produced at the steps leading to the conclusion are called derived premises. Each step in the derivation is justified by a principle of inference. Whether the derived premises are components of a valid argument is a difficult question that is beyond the scope of this article.   

An inductive argument is an argument that an arguer puts forward as inductively strong. In an inductive argument, the premises are intended only to be so strong that, if they were true, then it would be unlikely, although possible, that the conclusion is false. If the truth of the premises makes it unlikely (but not impossible) that the conclusion is false, then we may say that the argument is inductively strong. The following is an example of an inductively strong argument: 97% of the Republicans in town Z voted for McX, Jones is a Republican in town Z; therefore, Jones voted for McX.

In an argument like this, an arguer often will conclude "Jones probably voted for McX" instead of "Jones voted for McX," because they are signaling with the word "probably" that they intend to present an argument that is inductively strong but not valid.

In order to evaluate an argument it is important to determine whether or not it is deductive or inductive. It is inappropriate to criticize an inductively strong argument for being invalid. Based on the above characterizations, whether an argument is deductive or inductive turns on whether the arguer intends the argument to be valid or merely inductively strong, respectively. Sometimes the presence of certain expressions such as ‘definitely’ and ‘probably’ in the above two arguments indicate the relevant intensions of the arguer. Charity dictates that an invalid argument which is inductively strong be evaluated as an inductive argument unless there is clear evidence to the contrary.

Conductive arguments have been put forward as a third category of arguments (for example, Govier 2010). A conductive argument is an argument whose premises are convergent; the premises count separately in support of the conclusion. If one or more premises were removed from the argument, the degree of support offered by the remaining premises would stay the same. The previously given example of an argument with convergent premises is a conductive argument. The following is another example of a conductive argument. It most likely won’t rain tomorrow. The sky is red tonight. Also, the weather channel reported a 30% chance of rain for tomorrow.

The primary rationale for distinguishing conductive arguments from deductive and inductive ones is as follows. First, the premises of conductive arguments are always convergent, but the premises of deductive and inductive arguments are never convergent. Second, the evaluation of arguments with convergent premises requires not only that each premise be evaluated individually as support for the conclusion, but also the degree to which the premises support the conclusion collectively must be determined. This second consideration mitigates against treating conductive arguments merely as a collection of subarguments, each of which is deductive or inductive. The basic idea is that the support that the convergent premises taken together provide the conclusion must be considered in the evaluation of a conductive argument. With respect to the above conductive argument, the sky is red tonight and the weather channel reported a 30% chance of rain for tomorrow are offered together as (convergent) reasons for It most likely won’t rain tomorrow. Perhaps, collectively, but not individually, these reasons would persuade an addressee that it most likely won’t rain tomorrow.

4. Conclusion

A group of propositions constitutes an argument only if some are offered as reasons for one of them. Two approaches to identifying the definitive characteristics of arguments are the structural and pragmatic approaches. On both approaches, whether an act of offering reasons for a proposition P yields an argument depends on what the reasoner believes regarding both the truth of the reasons and the relationship between the reasons and P. A typical use of an argument is to rationally persuade its audience of the truth of the conclusion. To be effective in realizing this aim, the reasoner must think that there is real potential in the relevant context for her audience to be rationally persuaded of the conclusion by means of the offered premises. What, exactly, this presupposes about the audience depends on what the argument is and the context in which it is given. An argument may be classified as deductive, inductive, or conductive. Its classification into one of these categories is a prerequisite for its proper evaluation.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Bassham, G., W. Irwin, H. Nardone, and J. Wallace. 2005. Critical Thinking: A Student’s Introduction, 2nd ed. New York: McGraw-Hill.
  • Copi, I. and C. Cohen 2005. Introduction to Logic 12th ed. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall.
  • Doury, M. 2011. “Preaching to the Converted: Why Argue When Everyone Agrees?” Argumentation26(1): 99-114.
  • Eemeren F.H. van, R. Grootendorst, and F. Snoeck Henkemans. 2002. Argumentation: Analysis, Evaluation, Presentation. 2002. Mahwah, NJ: Lawrence Erlbaum Associates.
  • Eemeren F.H. van and R. Grootendorst. 1992. Argumentation, Communication, and Fallacies: A Pragma-Dialectical Perspective. Hillsdale, NJ: Lawrence Erblaum Associates.
  • Goodwin, J. 2007. “Argument has no function.” Informal Logic 27 (1): 69–90.
  • Govier, T. 2010. A Practical Study of Argument, 7th ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth.
  • Govier, T. 1987. “Reasons Why Arguments and Explanations are Different.” In Problems in Argument Analysis and Evaluation, Govier 1987, 159-176. Dordrecht, Holland: Foris.
  • Groarke, L. and C. Tindale 2004. Good Reasoning Matters!: A Constructive Approach to Critical Thinking, 3rd ed. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hitchcock, D. 2007. “Informal Logic and The Concept of Argument.” In Philosophy of Logic. D. Jacquette 2007, 101-129. Amsterdam: Elsevier.
  • Houtlosser, P. 2001. “Points of View.” In Critical Concepts in Argumentation Theory, F.H. van Eemeren 2001, 27-50. Amsterdam: Amsterdam University Press.
  • Johnson, R. and J. A. Blair 2006. Logical Self-Defense. New York: International Debate Education Association.
  • Johnson, R. 2000. Manifest Rationality. Mahwah, NJ: Lawrence Erlbaum Associates.
  • Kasachkoff, T. 1988. “Explaining and Justifying.” Informal Logic X, 21-30.
  • Meiland, J. 1989. “Argument as Inquiry and Argument as Persuasion.” Argumentation 3, 185-196.
  • Pinto, R. 1991. “Generalizing the Notion of Argument.” In Argument, Inference and Dialectic, R. Pinto (2010), 10-20. Dordrecht, Holland: Kluwer Academic Publishers. Originally published in van Eemeren, Grootendorst, Blair, and Willard, eds. Proceedings of the Second International Conference on Argumentation, vol.1A, 116-124. Amsterdam: SICSAT. Pinto, R.1995. “The Relation of Argument to Inference,” pp. 32-45 in Pinto (2010).
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. and R. Fogelin. 2010. Understanding Arguments: An Introduction to Informal Logic, 8th ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth.
  • Skyrms, B. 2000. Choice and Chance, 4th ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth.
  • Snoeck Henkemans, A.F. 2001. "Argumentation, explanation, and causality." In Text Representation: Linguistic and Psycholinguistic Aspects, T. Sanders, J. Schilperoord, and W. Spooren, eds. 2001, 231-246. Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing.
  • Thomas, S.N. 1986. Practical Reasoning in Natural Language. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall.
  • Walton, D. 1996. Argument Structure: A Pragmatic Theory. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.

Author Information

Matthew McKeon
Email: mckeonm@msu.edu
Michigan State University
U. S. A.

Deductive and Inductive Arguments

When assessing the quality of an argument, we ask how well its premises support its conclusion. More specifically, we ask whether the argument is either deductively valid or inductively strong.

deductive argument is an argument that is intended by the arguer to be deductively valid, that is, to provide a guarantee of the truth of the conclusion provided that the argument's premises are true. This point can be expressed also by saying that, in a deductive argument, the premises are intended to provide such strong support for the conclusion that, if the premises are true, then it would be impossible for the conclusion to be false. An argument in which the premises do succeed in guaranteeing the conclusion is called a (deductively) valid argument. If a valid argument has true premises, then the argument is said also to be sound. All arguments are either valid or invalid, and either sound or unsound; there is no middle ground, such as being somewhat valid.

Here is a valid deductive argument:

It's sunny in Singapore. If it's sunny in Singapore, then he won't be carrying an umbrella. So, he won't be carrying an umbrella.

The conclusion follows the word "So". The two premises of this argument would, if true, guarantee the truth of the conclusion. However, we have been given no information that would enable us to decide whether the two premises are both true, so we cannot assess whether the argument is deductively sound. It is one or the other, but we do not know which. If it turns out that the argument has a false premise and so is unsound, this won't change the fact that it is valid.

Here is a mildly strong inductive argument:

Every time I've walked by that dog, it hasn't tried to bite me. So, the next time I walk by that dog it won't try to bite me.

An inductive argument is an argument that is intended by the arguer to be strong enough that, if the premises were to be true, then it would be unlikely that the conclusion is false. So, an inductive argument's success or strength is a matter of degree, unlike with deductive arguments. There is no standard term for a successful inductive argument, but this article uses the term "strong." Inductive arguments that are not strong are said to be weak; there is no sharp line between strong and weak. The argument about the dog biting me would be stronger if we couldn't think of any relevant conditions for why the next time will be different than previous times. The argument also will be stronger the more times there were when I did walk by the dog. The argument will be weaker the fewer times I have walked by the dog. It will be weaker if relevant conditions about the past time will be different next time, such as that in the past the dog has been behind a closed gate, but next time the gate will be open.

An inductive argument can be affected by acquiring new premises (evidence), but a deductive argument cannot be. For example, this is a reasonably strong inductive argument:

Today, John said he likes Romona.
So, John likes Romona today.

but its strength is changed radically when we add this premise:

John told Felipé today that he didn’t really like Romona.

The distinction between deductive and inductive argumentation was first noticed by the Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) in ancient Greece. The difference between deductive and inductive arguments does not lie in the words used within the arguments, but rather in the intentions of the arguer. It comes from the relationship the arguer takes there to be between the premises and the conclusion. If the arguer believes that the truth of the premises definitely establishes the truth of the conclusion, then the argument is deductive. If the arguer believes that the truth of the premises provides only good reasons to believe the conclusion is probably true, then the argument is inductive. If we who are assessing  the quality of the argument have no information about the intentions of the arguer, then we check for both. That is, we assess the argument to see whether it is deductively valid and whether it is inductively strong.

The concept of deductive validity can be given alternative definitions to help you grasp the concept. Below are five different definitions of the same concept. It is common to drop the word deductive from the term deductively valid:

  1. An argument is valid if the premises can’t all be true without the conclusion also being true.
  2. An argument is valid if the truth of all its premises forces the conclusion to be true.
  3. An argument is valid if it would be inconsistent for all its premises to be true and its conclusion to be false.
  4. An argument is valid if its conclusion follows with certainty from its premises.
  5. An argument is valid if it has no counterexample, that is, a possible situation that makes all the premises true and the conclusion false.

Some analysts prefer to distinguish inductive arguments from "conductive" arguments; the latter are arguments giving explicit reasons for and against a conclusion, and requiring the evaluator of the argument to weigh these competing considerations, that is, to consider the pros and cons. This article considers conductive arguments to be a kind of inductive argument.

The noun "deduction" refers to the process of advancing or establishing a deductive argument, or going through a process of reasoning that can be reconstructed as a deductive argument. "Induction" refers to the process of advancing an inductive argument, or making use of reasoning that can be reconstructed as an inductive argument.

Although inductive strength is a matter of degree, deductive validity and deductive soundness are not. In this sense, deductive reasoning is much more cut and dried than inductive reasoning. Nevertheless, inductive strength is not a matter of personal preference; it is a matter of whether the premise ought to promote a higher degree of belief in the conclusion.

Because deductive arguments are those in which the truth of the conclusion is thought to be completely guaranteed and not just made probable by the truth of the premises, if the argument is a sound one, then we say the conclusion is "contained within" the premises; that is, the conclusion does not go beyond what the premises implicitly require. Think of sound deductive arguments as squeezing the conclusion out of the premises within which it is hidden. For this reason, deductive arguments usually turn crucially upon definitions and rules of mathematics and formal logic.

Consider how the rules of formal logic apply to this deductive argument:

John is ill. If John is ill, then he won't be able to attend our meeting today. Therefore, John won't be able to attend our meeting today.

That argument is valid due to its formal or logical structure. To see why, notice that if the word 'ill' were replaced with 'happy', the argument would still be valid because it would retain its special logical structure (called modus ponens by logicians). Here is the form of any argument having the structure of modus ponens:


If P, then Q

So, Q

The capital letters should be thought of as variables that can be replaced with declarative sentences, or statements, or propositions, namely items that are true or false. The investigation of logical forms that involve whole sentences and not their subjects and verbs and other parts is called Propositional Logic.

The question of whether all, or merely most, valid deductive arguments are valid because of their logical structure is still controversial in the field of the philosophy of logic, but that question will not be explored further in this article.

Inductive arguments can take very wide-ranging forms. Some have the form of making a claim about a population or set based only on information from a sample of that population, a subset. Other inductive arguments draw conclusions by appeal to evidence, or authority, or causal relationships. There are other forms.

Here is a somewhat strong inductive argument having the form of an argument based on authority:

The police said John committed the murder. So, John committed the murder.

Here is an inductive argument based on evidence:

The witness said John committed the murder. So, John committed the murder.

Here is a stronger inductive argument based on better evidence:

Two independent witnesses claimed John committed the murder. John's fingerprints are on the murder weapon. John confessed to the crime. So, John committed the murder.

This last argument, if its premises are known to be true, is no doubt good enough for a jury to convict John, but none of these three arguments about John committing the murder is strong enough to be called "valid," at least not in the technical sense of deductively valid. However, some lawyers will tell their juries that these are valid arguments, so we critical thinkers need to be on the alert as to how people around us are using the term "valid." You have to be alert to what they mean rather than what they say. From the barest clues, the English detective Sherlock Holmes cleverly "deduced" who murdered whom, but actually he made only an educated guess. Strictly speaking, he produced an inductive argument and not a deductive one. Charles Darwin, who discovered the process of evolution, is famous for his "deduction" that circular atolls in the oceans are actually coral growths on the top of barely submerged volcanoes, but he really performed an induction, not a deduction.

It is worth noting that some dictionaries and texts define "deduction" as reasoning from the general to specific and define "induction" as reasoning from the specific to the general. However, there are many inductive arguments that do not have that form, for example, "I saw her kiss him, really kiss him, so I'm sure she's having an affair."

The mathematical proof technique called "mathematical induction" is deductive and not inductive. Proofs that make use of mathematical induction typically take the following form:

Property P is true of the natural number 0.
For all natural numbers n, if P holds of n then P also holds of n + 1.
Therefore, P is true of all natural numbers.

When such a proof is given by a mathematician, and when all the premises are true, then the conclusion follows necessarily. Therefore, such an inductive argument is deductive. It is deductively sound, too.

Because the difference between inductive and deductive arguments involves the strength of evidence which the author believes the premises provide for the conclusion, inductive and deductive arguments differ with regard to the standards of evaluation that are applicable to them. The difference does not have to do with the content or subject matter of the argument, nor with the presence or absence of any particular word. Indeed, the same utterance may be used to present either a deductive or an inductive argument, depending on what the person advancing it believes. Consider as an example:

Dom Perignon is a champagne, so it must be made in France.

It might be clear from context that the speaker believes that having been made in the Champagne area of France is part of the defining feature of "champagne" and so the conclusion follows from the premise by definition. If it is the intention of the speaker that the evidence is of this sort, then the argument is deductive. However, it may be that no such thought is in the speaker's mind. He or she may merely believe that nearly all champagne is made in France, and may be reasoning probabilistically. If this is his or her intention, then the argument is inductive.

As noted, the distinction between deductive and inductive has to do with the strength of the justification that the arguer intends that the premises provide for the conclusion. Another complication in our discussion of deduction and induction is that the arguer might intend the premises to justify the conclusion when in fact the premises provide no justification at all. Here is an example:

All odd numbers are integers.
All even numbers are integers.
Therefore, all odd numbers are even numbers.

This argument is invalid because the premises provide no support whatsoever for the conclusion. However, if this argument were ever seriously advanced, we must assume that the author would believe that the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion. Therefore, this argument is still deductive. It is not inductive.

Given the way the terms “deductive argument” and “inductive argument” are defined here, an argument is always one or the other and never both, but in deciding which one of the two it is, it is common to ask whether it meets both the deductive standards and inductive standards. Given a set of premises and their intended conclusion, we analysts will ask whether it is deductively valid, and, if so, whether it is also deductively sound. If it is not deductively valid, then we may go on to assess whether it is inductively strong.

We are very likely to use the information that the argument is not deductively valid to ask ourselves what premises, if they were to be assumed, would make the argument be valid. Then we might ask whether these premises were implicit and intended originally. Similarly, we might ask what premises are needed to improve the strength of an inductive argument, and we might ask whether these premises were intended all along. If so, then we change our mind about what argument existed was back in the original passage. So, the application of deductive and inductive standards is used in the process of extracting the argument from the passage within which it is embedded. The process goes like this: Extract the argument from the passage; assess it with deductive and inductive standards; perhaps revise the decision about which argument existed in the original passage; then reassess this new argument using our deductive and inductive standards.

Implicit premises and implicit features of explicit premises can play important roles in argument evaluation. Suppose we want to know whether Julius Caesar did conquer Rome. In response, some historian might point out that it could be concluded with certainty from these two pieces of information:

The general of the Roman Legions of Gaul crossed the Rubicon River and conquered Rome.

Caesar was the general of the Roman Legions in Gaul at that time.

That would produce a valid argument. But now notice that, if "at that time" were missing from the second piece of information, then the argument would not be valid. Here is why. Maybe Caesar was the general at one time, but Tiberius was the general at the time of the river crossing and Rome conquering. If the phrase “at that time” were missing, you the analyst have to worry about how likely it is that the phrase was intended. So, you are faced with two arguments, one valid and one invalid, and you don't know which is the intended argument.

See also the articles on "Argument" and "Validity and Soundness" in this encyclopedia.

Author Information

IEP Staff
The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a more elaborate replacement article.

Gianni Vattimo (1936− )

Gianni Vattimo is an Italian philosopher and cultural commentator. He studied in Turin, Italy with Luigi Pareyson, and in Heidelberg under Hans-Georg Gadamer. Central to Vattimo's philosophy are the existentialist and proto-postmodernist influences of Nietzsche, Heidegger, Gadamer and Kuhn. He has also become prominent outside of philosophical circles through his political activism in supporting gay rights and from his position as a Member of the European Parliament. His ideas have had a wide-ranging influence across disciplines such as feminism, theology, sexuality studies, and globalisation.

In his philosophy Vattimo explores the relationship between postmodernism and nihilism, treating nihilism affirmatively rather than as something to be overcome. Vattimo draws upon both the theoretical work of Nietzsche and Heidegger, and the ‘signs of the times’. By the latter Vattimo refers to the social and political pluralism and the absence of metaphysical foundations that he believes characterise late modernity, a term Vattimo uses to refer to advanced societies in their present state to show their connection to modernity; the term ‘postmodern’ implies more discontinuity than Vattimo would like. Vattimo thinks that in developed societies there is a ‘plurality of interpretations’ because through the media and ever-increasing movement of peoples it is no longer possible to believe in one dominant way of seeing the world. The freeing-up of these interpretations is possible, Vattimo thinks, because one can no longer plausibly conceive Being as a foundation, that is, of the universe as a rational metaphysically-ordered system of causes and effects. In turn, the lack of plausibility in foundationalism is due to the ‘event’ of the death of God (both the idea of Being as foundation and the event of the death of God shall be explained in due course).  A significant portion of Vattimo’s work is devoted to explaining how the only plausible late-modern, Western philosophical outlook is ‘hermeneutical nihilism’. Broadly, this is the view that ‘there are no facts, only interpretations’, to use a phrase from Nietzsche’s unpublished notebooks (Colli and Montinari, 1967, VIII.1, 323, 7 [60]). Vattimo also investigates the implications of this position for religion, politics, ethics, art, technology, and the media.

Vattimo is well known for his philosophical style of ‘weak thought’ (pensiero debole). ‘Weak thought’ is an attempt to understand and re-configure traces from the history of thought in ways that accord with postmodern conditions. In doing so, the aim of ‘weak thought’ is to create an ethic of ‘weakness’. Vattimo’s efforts to create a postmodern ethic are closely related to his return to religion from the late 1980s onwards, a significant point in his own intellectual development. His renewed interest in religion has also acted as a blueprint for a return to philosophical engagement with, and commitment to, Communism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The End of History
  3. Hermeneutical Nihilism
    1. The End of History, Nihilism, and Nietzsche’s ‘Death of God’
    2. Heidegger: Being, Technology and Nihilism
    3. Ontology, ‘Exchange Value’ as Language, and Verwindung as Resignation
    4. ‘Weak Thought,’ Hermeneutics and Verwindung as Convalescence-Alteration
  4. Return to Religion
    1. Reasons behind Vattimo’s Return to Religion
    2. The Philosophical Importance of the Christian Message in Vattimo’s Thought
  5. Ethics
  6. Political Philosophy
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Vattimo
    2. Works on Vattimo
    3. Other Works Cited

1. Life

Gianni Vattimo was born on January 4, 1936, in Turin, Italy. He was sent to an oratory school as a child. This strongly Catholic environment led to him becoming involved with Catholic youth groups such as Azione Cattolica. After completing his schooling, Vattimo studied at the University of Turin under Luigi Pareyson. He graduated in 1959 with a thesis on Aristotle that was published in 1961. To fund his studies Vattimo found employment as a television host and at a local high school. At the same time, Vattimo was working increasingly closely with Pareyson. Throughout this period Vattimo was also involved in activism, including protests against South African apartheid.

Vattimo has stated that he stopped being a Catholic when, after having gone to study in Germany, he ‘no longer read the Italian newspapers’ (Vattimo and Paterlini, 2009: 27). By this remark, he sought to imply that Catholicism and Italian culture were closely linked at the time. In 1963, Vattimo had taken up a two-year Humboldt Fellowship and was living in Heidelberg, Germany, studying under Karl Löwith and Hans-Georg Gadamer. Returning to Turin after his fellowship ended, Vattimo took up a position as adjunct professor at the university in 1964 to teach aesthetics, especially those of Heidegger. In 1968 Vattimo became a full professor of aesthetics at the University of Turin. In 1969, Vattimo finished his translation of Gadamer’s Truth and Method into Italian (it was published in 1970). During the 1970s Vattimo published many books, including his personal favourite, the 1974 work Il soggetto e la maschera (‘The subject and the mask’).

To Pareyson’s dismay, Vattimo became a Maoist after reading Mao’s works while in hospital in 1968. However, Vattimo was not seen as revolutionary enough by some groups. In 1978, the Red Brigades threatened Vattimo, spreading information to the media about Vattimo’s homosexuality. Moreover, some of Vattimo’s students were involved in terrorism around this time. When Vattimo received letters from some of his imprisoned students, he realised that they were attempting to justify their actions on metaphysical grounds. These events contributed to Vattimo reconsidering his own theoretical position. The fruit of this reflection was Vattimo’s notion of ‘weak thought’: that the history of Western metaphysics is a history of the weakening of strong structures (epistemic structures that purport to provide thinking with firm principles and criteria for judgement), and that philosophy should be an ‘adventure of difference’. Through these claims, Vattimo attempts to express the view that one should not aim for fixed philosophical solutions or for certainty with regard to knowledge. Rather, one should embrace the endless play of interpretations constitutive of late modernity. During this period Vattimo wrote some of his most well-known books, such as The End of Modernity and The Transparent Society.

There are recurrent themes and beliefs in Vattimo’s life, especially the philosophies of Nietzsche and Heidegger, Communism, and religion. The latter has come back into Vattimo’s life in a significant way since the late 1980s and 1990s. His faith is difficult to categorise, being a non-dogmatic and highly idiosyncratic form of the Catholicism with which he was brought up. Vattimo ‘thanks God’ that he is an atheist, says that he ‘believes that he believes’, and has closely related his faith to his philosophy of weak thought. He has also returned to the Communism of his younger years, albeit in a manner similarly ‘weakened’. Aside from his theoretical output, Vattimo has been active politically and was elected as a Member of the European Parliament in 1999. Since retiring from his university post in Turin in 2008 he has continued to publish prolifically.

2. The End of History

Vattimo contends that the Western postmodern experience is that of the end of history. By this he means that the way we can view the past can no longer be as if it had a unilinear character. By ‘unilinear character’, Vattimo means a way of writing and viewing history that sees it as a single train of events, often working towards a goal and privileging one interpretation of the past. Vattimo argues that there is no longer a coherent narrative which is accepted in the West. The typical modern narrative was one of progress, whether this concerned scientific and technological innovation, increasing freedom, or even a Marxist interpretation of history. For this narrative to be coherent it must view the past in terms of cause and effect. It must see that which has happened before as determining the present, and therefore determining the future. According to Vattimo, history loses its unilinear character in three principal ways: theoretically, demographically, and through the rise of the society of generalised communication. For the first way, Vattimo turns to Walter Benjamin’s essay ‘Theses on the Philosophy of History’ (1938), in which Benjamin argues that unilinear history is a product of class conflict. The powerful — kings, emperors, nobles — make history in a manner denied to the poor. Vattimo acknowledges that Benjamin was speaking from a nascent tradition, already begun by Marx and Nietzsche, of seeing history as constructed and not impartial. Given the selective, power-laden nature of unilinear history, Vattimo surmises that it would be mistaken to think there is only one true history. Such a realisation has profound consequences for the idea of progress. If there is not one unique history but many histories, then there is no one clear goal throughout historical development. This implication applies equally to sacred eschatology as to secular Marxist hopes of world revolution and of the realisation of a classless society. In modern Europe, where the unilinear conception of history had flourished, demographic effects have acted to undermine this very notion. In particular, mass immigration has led to a greater prominence of alternative histories.

Furthermore, the rebellion of previously ruled peoples is a common theme in history. However, such rebellion becomes postmodern in the context of the age of mass communication and the after-effects of the two World Wars. Of course, a hallmark of the Reformation was the importance of the printed word. Nevertheless, it did not facilitate the en masse expression and preservation of alternative viewpoints as do radio, television and — mostly significantly — the internet. Hence for Vattimo the advent of the society of mass communication is the third major component of the ‘end of history’ and the start of postmodernity. Vattimo proposes:

(a) that the mass media play a decisive role in the birth of a postmodern society; (b) that they do not make this postmodern more ‘transparent’, but more complex, even chaotic; and finally (c) that it is in precisely this relative ‘chaos’ that our hopes for emancipation lie (Vattimo, 1992: 4).

The Transparent Society, in which Vattimo most clearly outlined his ideas on the end of history, was written shortly before the mass uptake of the internet by Western consumers. Nevertheless, Vattimo’s analysis of mass communication applies even more strongly in light of the effects of widespread internet use. While alternative television and radio stations gave voices to more groups, Twitter, Facebook, blogs and web forums go further by allowing anyone with minimal access to technology to express their worldview. Vattimo acknowledges that this view of the effect of the culture of mass communication is in contrast to the positions of Adorno, Horkheimer, and Orwell. These thinkers predicted that a homogenisation of society would be the result of such communications technology. Additionally, following his reading of Nietzsche, Vattimo only believes in the possibility of interpretations, rather than facts. Nevertheless, he takes great pains to show that his diagnosis of the situation of late modernity is a cogent interpretation. In particular, he claims that it makes the best possible sense of the interpretative plurality he sees around him.

For Vattimo, freedom of information and media multiplicity eliminate the possibility of conceiving of a single reality. This has epistemological consequences, since the plurality of histories and voices in the age of mass communication brings multiple rationalities and anthropologies to the fore. This undermines the possibility of constructing knowledge on certain foundations. Thus, the tendency to universalise and impose a single view of how the world is ordered on others is weakened. As a result, Vattimo sees in late modernity the realisation of Nietzsche’s prophecy of the world becoming a fable. That is, Vattimo considers it impossible to find objective reality among images received from the media: there is no way to step outside, or be an impartial spectator, of these images. The dissolution of the unilinear conception of history, and its implications for modern views on knowledge and reality, liberates differences by allowing local rationalities to come to the fore.

3. Hermeneutical Nihilism

a. The End of History, Nihilism, and Nietzsche’s ‘Death of God’

Vattimo argues that the implications for philosophy of the end of history, and therefore of modernity, are profound. The postmodern experience is fragmented, whereas modernity, with its coherent narrative, is unified. Thinking within a unified, coherent narrative is oriented towards a foundation or origin. It sees history as moving forward from this origin through a logical progression. By lacking this sense of progress, postmodern experience for Vattimo thus coincides with nihilism. In searching for an anchor for the self, the postmodern person finds no centre and no certain foundations. As such, Vattimo views the notion of nihilism as the expression of the dislocation humans feel in the postmodern age. Nihilism is encapsulated by a Nietzschean phrase that Vattimo uses in his work The End of Modernity: that man ‘rolls “from the centre toward X”…because, to use a Heideggerian expression for nihilism, “there is nothing left of Being as such’’’ (Vattimo, 1988a: 20). Not only is a foundation for knowledge undesirable in the fragmentation of experience characteristic of the postmodern age, but it is also impossible. Nietzsche’s term for this experience of nihilism is the ‘death of God’. This is not meant in a metaphysical sense, but rather as the loss of the highest values of which God is the highest of all. It is impossible to find a centre, a universally-accessible metaphysical foundation amidst all the images and messages delivered in a society of mass communication. As a result, nihilism entails that there is no clear point of origin, no accessible epistemic foundation, and no universally-shared sense of where we are going. Rather than seeing this in a negative light, Vattimo sees nihilism as our ‘sole opportunity’ for emancipation from the violence of metaphysics, as will be explicated below.

b. Heidegger: Being, Technology and Nihilism

While Heidegger is not conventionally seen as a nihilist, by reading him through Nietzsche, Vattimo is able to draw upon many of Heidegger’s ideas to enrich and deepen his own concept of nihilism. Heidegger thought that metaphysics was the history of the forgetting of Being, of how things are. Heidegger viewed philosophy from Plato to Nietzsche as a history of metaphysics. Since Plato, the question of Being had been pushed aside by metaphysics in favour of the question of truth, and of the relationship between subject and object. Yet the question of truth ignores the prior ontological question, for both subject and object exist. Metaphysics, through the use of reason, establishes foundations upon which truth is made objective and to which one ‘must give one’s assent or conform’ (Vattimo, 1999: 43).  Heidegger undercuts this establishment of foundations through his notion of the human being as ‘Dasein’. The term ‘Dasein’ refers to the human being as that which always has a pre-ontological interpretation of the world. This itself is given by the contingencies of how one is ‘thrown’ into the world, such as where, when and in what kind of environment one is brought up. In Vattimo’s reading of Heidegger, the end of metaphysics entails the same consequence as the death of God: nihilism and the emancipation of different interpretations, the latter no longer held to account by rationalistic metaphysics.

In his reading of Heidegger, Vattimo sees metaphysics reaching its point of culmination in modern technology. Before looking at Vattimo’s specifically nihilistic reading of Heidegger on technology, it is necessary to outline Heidegger’s thoughts on the issue. In ‘The Question Concerning Technology’ and Identity and Difference, Heidegger states that the essence of technology is not something technological: it is not merely instrumental, but also a way of revealing. The idea of ‘revealing’ comes from Heidegger’s phenomenological rejection of Kant divorcing how things appear to us from how they really are; Heidegger thought they are connected, and the appearance of something in our consciousness is how it is revealed to us, how it is brought into unconcealment. Every unconcealment also conceals, however, as our knowledge of beings is always fragmentary; there is always more to the essence of a thing than is revealed to us. Technology’s role in unconcealment for Heidegger is evident in the interest he pays to the ancient Greek etymology of techné, which emphasises technology’s role in ‘opening up’ and ‘revealing’. Techné is a form of poeisis, a Greek term for a poetic revealing that is a bringing-forth from unconcealment, whether an artisan brings-forth a chalice which was previously a potential chalice, or whether blossom brings itself into bloom. Primitive technology allowed nature to reveal itself ‘poetically’, such as a farmer watching crops grow and harvesting them or a windmill converting the energy generated by the wind when it blew. Industrial technology, on the other hand, ‘challenges’ nature by placing an unreasonable demand on it, forcing it to produce what is required of it by humans. For example, with man-made hydroelectricity dams the mode of revealing is a ‘challenging forth’, the way in which the river reveals itself is no longer the same. Rather than the Rhine appearing poetically as water flowing as a feature of a larger landscape, modern technology has made it become an energy resource. Equally, tourism cannot see the Rhine as an object of nature, but rather merely as a source of income. All nature is challenged in this way. Humans are also challenged, for they are reduced to the level of objects used for production. For example, human resources departments can be viewed as regarding humans as resources for production. A Humans waiting to go to work is, in this industrial society, like an aeroplane on a runway, having little value being brought-forth themselves, but only for something else; essentially both are ‘standing reserve’, valuable only when employed and at the mercy of a system which uses and manipulates them as and when required. The term for this type of revealing which is a challenging on a global scale is Ge-Stell (enframing). Ge-Stell is the culmination of metaphysics because it involves the total planning of everything in perfectly ordered relationships of cause and effect, all capable of unlimited manipulation.

Heidegger had a negative view of technology because of its nihilistic conclusion as the culmination of metaphysics. While Vattimo agrees with Heidegger’s critique of technology, he also sees liberating opportunities provided by it. These arise principally through drawing upon Heidegger’s later work: the notion of ‘the first flashing up of Ereignis’ (Vattimo, 1988a: 26), where Vattimo references Heidegger’s Identity and Difference. In Vattimo’s reading of this quotation, time spent considering Ge-Stell leads to an understanding of the event-like nature of Being through the Ereignis, the event of transpropriation. Heidegger’s later work is less interested in Dasein as the home or determining site of Being. Rather, Being is a horizon in which things appear, ‘the aperture within which alone man and the world, subject and object, can enter into relationship’ (Vattimo, 2004: 6). For the later Heidegger, Being is a series of irruptions, or ‘events’. There is a Selbst (same) which ‘sends’, or ‘destines’ (Geschick) these events, although it is wrong to think of the Selbst as a being, for this would be to repeat metaphysics. Demonstrating the influence of both Heidegger and Gadamer, Vattimo thinks that Being is nothing other than language. Therefore, the way Being appears to us is in a series of historical announcements (events) that colour our interpretation of the traces of Being from previous epochs (the sendings of Being). The traces of Being are transmitted through linguistic traditions into which we - as Dasein - are always already thrown.

Vattimo extends Heidegger’s understanding of technology to take into account contemporary communications technology. In the play of images and messages attained through media such as television, radio and the internet, the difference between subject and object dissolves. For instance, one may doubt that someone’s online profile is ‘real’. Moreover, how could one ever verify its claim to representing reality? In the Ereignis which results from Ge-Stell, metaphysical designations such as ‘subject’ and ‘object’ disappear as everything is challenged-forth. In the Enlightenment era, the rational Cartesian ‘thinking thing’ is not only the subject, but also the foundation of knowledge.  This anthropocentrism continued in different ways through the construction of unilinear narratives surrounding progress and science. As Ge-Stell challenges the distinction between humans and things as they are all reduced to causal determined standing-reserve, capable of manipulation, the Ereignis is the ‘event of appropriation’ that Vattimo considers a ‘trans-propriation’. In the Ereignis, humanity and Being (traditionally considered as that which grounds the rule of reason) lose their metaphysical properties of subject and object. As a result, Being is shown not as a foundation or a thing, but as an ‘exchange value’: as ‘language and... the tradition constituted by the transmission and interpretation of messages’ (Vattimo, 1988a: 26).

c. Ontology, ‘Exchange Value’ as Language, and Verwindung as Resignation

Before discussing exactly how language and tradition function within Vattimo’s philosophy, it is worth examining why he concerns himself with ontology at all. Some philosophers take the end of metaphysics to constitute a total departure from ontology, for they feel it is too closely associated with metaphysical foundationalism. Vattimo’s problem with this view is that a non-ontological approach to knowledge once again locates the origin of knowledge in beings, and in a manner that pertains to their own realms. Yet beings will plan and organise their realms such that an authority akin to the one previously associated with metaphysical Being is postulated of beings. This could lead to a relativism in which local epistemologies or groups are incapable of external criticism. Moreover, relativism may itself take on the appearance of a metaphysical principle.

Rather than approaching the end of metaphysics from a relativistic standpoint or retreating into a local epistemology, Vattimo looks at the postmodern experience through a nihilistic ontology. The postmodern experience is fragmented, since the ‘death of God’ means that there is an irreducible plurality of perspectives on the world. This fragmentation is exacerbated by the society of mass communication. Nevertheless, for Vattimo there are traces of traditions by which we can - and must - orient ourselves. It is in this sense that Vattimo contends that Being is reduced to ‘exchange value’. Our experience of existence is absorbed into the language we use. This language is taken from traces of traditions from past epochs. What Vattimo considers to be potentially liberating - our ‘sole opportunity’ and ‘nihilistic vocation’ - is how we approach, consider, and re-use the traces of Being from past traditions. This process involves the Heideggerian concept Verwindung.

Verwindung has multiple meanings for Vattimo, such as being resigned to tradition, yet also distorting or ‘twisting’ it and as a result getting better from it as a form of ‘convalescence’ from the ‘metaphysical malady’ (Vattimo, 2006: 151); metaphysics cannot be overcome by standing it ‘on its head’ (Vattimo, 2006: 151), for this would be to lay another foundation. Rather, Vattimo thinks that metaphysics can only be overcome by a long convalescence. To this end, Vattimo contrasts Verwindung with an Überwindung (overcoming) of modernity or an Aufhebung (dialectical overcoming in the Hegelian sense). If one were to overcome modernity, to leave metaphysics behind altogether, it would be to create a new foundation; whether locally, in the relativist sense described above, or as a new global epistemological foundation, one would be repeating the metaphysical tendency to create foundations. Moreover, in modernity Being was reduced to the value of the new. After the ‘death of God’, the geschick (the epoch of history of Being) in which we are living is one of dislocation where the narrative of progress has been demythologised.

If metaphysics is not to be overcome, but ‘twisted’, what does this involve and how does it happen? Lexically, Verwindung

is a convalescence (in the sense of ‘ein Krankheit verwinden’: to heal, to be cured of an illness) and a distorting (although this is a rather marginal meaning linked to ‘winden’, meaning ‘to twist’, and to the sense of a deviant alteration which the prefix ‘ver—‘ also possesses). The notion of ‘convalescence’ is linked to another meaning as well, that of ‘resignation’…Besides these meanings of the term, there is that of ‘distortion’ to consider as well (Vattimo, 1988a: 172-173).

This notion of Verwindung is related to Vattimo’s view of nihilism as our sole opportunity. He follows Nietzsche in referring to an ‘accomplished nihilism’, one which aims at creating one’s own values after the highest values have been dissolved. The opportunity of accomplished nihilism is limited by language, and this is where Verwindung comes into play:

Tradition is the transmitting of linguistic messages that constitute the horizon within which Dasein is thrown as an historically determined project: and tradition derives its importance from the fact that Being, as a horizon of disclosure in which things appear, can arise only as a trace of past words (Vattimo, 1988a: 120).

The exchange value of Being is like that of a common currency in the community. Another phrase Vattimo uses to show the inescapable influence of the metaphysical tradition is ‘the ontology of decline’: that we are living in ‘the Occident’ which is ‘the land of sunset (and hence, of Being)’. This nostalgia is a form of resignation, since one cannot escape metaphysics without creating a new foundation. Yet in doing so, one would succumb to the sort of authoritarianism one wishes to escape.

d. ‘Weak Thought,’ Hermeneutics and Verwindung as Convalescence-Alteration

In the postmodern experience, Dasein is thrown into an existence in which experience is fragmented. Furthermore, in this existence thought is limited by the common currency of Being as a collection of linguistic traces mediated by tradition. One cannot overcome metaphysics as a history of Being without falling into authoritarianism. However, in recognising the flaws of authoritarianism, one tacitly realises nihilism as the sole opportunity to find liberation. Such liberation occurs through weakening the traces of the tradition into which one is thrown. Nostalgic resignation, according to Vattimo, is not mere acceptance. The Being of Dasein is interpretative, and therefore the reception of traces of tradition is active, rather than passive. This is the active nihilism of Nietzsche’s ‘philosophy of the morning’. In Vattimo’s work, it is what came to be known in the early 1980s as the philosophical style of ‘weak thought’. Through Andenken and Sorge (care) one recollects the traces of Being handed down though the linguistic tradition. In receiving these traces, however, one interprets them in accordance with the sending of Being - the horizon - into which one is thrown. Nostalgia is also a recovery in that it involves a rewriting of the tradition. The sending of Being is an event rather than an unchanging essence, as it would be on a Platonic conception of Being.

If Being is the experience of existence, and Being is linguistic, then the issue of interpretation will come into play when expressing one’s existence. During the event of the sending of Being, one cannot conceive of traces of Being as simply true when recollecting them, that they are not ‘facts’ to be remembered. Therefore, although Vattimo sees Verwindung as a resignation to Being, it is an ironic remembrance rather than a total acceptance of it. Through recollecting and twisting traces of Being in light of the event of the sending of Being, one weakens strong truth claims. As a result, one is ‘healed’ from what Vattimo considers to be the violence of metaphysics. This ‘convalescent’ aspect of Verwindung occurs through the hermeneutical event of the act of interpretation. Determined in this manner, Vattimo’s philosophy of ‘weak thought’ involves a withdrawal from metaphysics by avoiding new foundations or complete assent to any position.

4. Return to Religion

a. Reasons behind Vattimo’s Return to Religion

On the face of it, Vattimo’s philosophy does not appear to be integrally connected to religion. Nevertheless, a significant proportion of Vattimo’s writings in the last twenty years have been devoted to religion and religious themes. Vattimo’s return to writing on religion was gradual, comprising only brief mentions in his works in the late 1980s, but appearing prominently in the 1990s. While personal factors, including old age and the death of loved ones, brought him back to his faith, Vattimo is first and foremost a theorist. During that period, the profile of religion in society was growing through the Iranian Revolution and the role of Pope John Paul II in the breakdown of Communism. Vattimo developed his ideas on religion as an extension of his philosophies of hermeneutical nihilism, ‘weak thought’, and the relation of metaphysics to ontology. This largely entailed a reading of Heidegger through which the gradual weakening of metaphysics, rather than its return, is anticipated. Nevertheless, metaphysics cannot simply be overcome; it must be worked through in the forms of life we have inherited and are developing. The forms of life and traditions we inherit are the limits of our thought and language. Being is disclosed within language, so it is disclosed within cultural horizons. Hermeneutical nihilism leaves room for faith by dissolving the authoritarianism of reason.

Vattimo feels compelled to ascertain the implications of hermeneutical nihilism and ‘weak thought’ for Christianity. He sees Christianity as a set of beliefs and practices synonymous with Europe, and an inalienable facet in the formation of his character and personal life. Vattimo goes beyond merely applying his idea of ‘weak thought’ to Christianity. He twists Christianity in accordance with Verwindung, yet views the message of Christianity as a stimulus. This stimulus explains the sending of Being in late modernity as an irreducible plurality of interpretations. In part, this conception is the result of Vattimo’s acquaintance with the work of René Girard, whose notion of the ‘natural sacred’ he sees as a transcription of Heidegger’s attitude to Being.

b. The Philosophical Importance of the Christian Message in Vattimo’s Thought

René Girard’s theological anthropology has focussed on the importance of Christ’s death and resurrection in revealing the mechanisms that underpin society. On Girard’s view, natural religions are founded upon the need to create victims to keep order in society. The mimetic drive in humans to desire what the other has escalates until violence threatens to consume society. A sacrificial scapegoat is killed to prevent the society’s destruction. Over time this becomes ever more ritualised and assumes a sacral and divine character. Girard sees the Old and New Testaments as intended to reveal this victim-based mechanism. Jesus’ purpose was not, as Christian theology proposes, to be the perfect sacrifice for his father. Instead, Girard thinks that Jesus was put on the cross due to his revelation of this mechanism. Vattimo, who likewise considers the sacred to involve violence, saw the potential for adaptation of Girard’s notion of the natural sacred. Unlike Girard, Vattimo does not see Jesus as revealing an anthropological truth (the victim-based mechanism). Vattimo instead sees Jesus as the instigator of the desacralising weakening that has come to fruition in modernity. This weakening occurs through the exposition of the tendency of religions to be authoritarian and violent, particularly in demanding sacrifice.

Vattimo sees Heidegger’s philosophy ‘as an active…revelation of the same victimary mechanism that Girard makes us discover in the Judeo-Christian Scripture’ (Vattimo, 2010: 80). Vattimo thinks that Heidegger’s philosophy is a transcription of the Judeo-Christian revelation, especially as the latter is interpreted by Girard. For Girard, this is ‘the basic victimary structure of all human culture; for Heidegger, it exposes the “secret” of metaphysics, which is the forgetting of Being and the identification of it with beings, objectivity etc.’ (Vattimo, 2010: 81). The meaning of history for both Girard and Heidegger, as Vattimo reads them, is emancipation from violence. Vattimo sees in Girard a link between the ‘violent’ God of metaphysics and the violence he sees in metaphysics, broadly following Heidegger’s understanding of it. The notion of God referred to here is the onto-theological, maximising concept of God containing the attributes of omnipotence, omniscience, and judgment. In his introduction to Vattimo and Girard’s Christianity, Truth and Weakening Faith, Pierpaolo Antonello makes clear the link between Girard and Vattimo:

The rupture of the sacrificial circle, accomplished by the Judeo-Christian revelation (in Girard’s terms) or the kenosis of God through the incarnation (in Vattimo’s), launched a historical development that culminates in the present age (Antonello, 2010: 9).

For Girard, the culmination is the present age in which humans have a decision to continue with mimetic rivalry and the sacrifice of scapegoats even when it has become fully exposed. The exposition has taken place at an apocalyptic level, that of the brink of a global nuclear holocaust, and through Jesus’ call for charity. For Vattimo, the culmination is the realisation of the process of secularisation in hermeneutics.

Reading Girard helped Vattimo to reappraise Christianity, and to see faith in Christ as faith in the weakening of strong structures. Vattimo began to connect Girard’s theological anthropology to Heidegger’s attitude to Being. The violence of the natural sacred is akin, in Vattimo’s eyes, to the violence of metaphysics. Girard also impressed on Vattimo the importance of Christ for explaining the current situation of hermeneutical nihilism. While Girard focussed on his notions of mimesis and the natural sacred, Vattimo translated these ideas into terms borrowed from the language of theology. Vattimo draws upon the ‘incarnation’ in a variety of ways, principally through the closely related notion of kenosis, a term often used in the Bible to refer to the ‘self-emptying’ of Christ (Philippians 2:7). In line with this association, Vattimo refers to a variety of Biblical passages in support of his understanding of kenosis. He quotes Hebrews 1:1-2 in Beyond Interpretation, one of the earlier extended pieces of writing in his return to religion. In that text Vattimo used kenosis to refer to the archetype of hermeneutic plurality in the West, comparing and contrasting it with other, less suitable (that is, in Vattimo’s view, metaphysical) candidates such as Aristotle’s claim that ‘Being is said in many ways’. For Vattimo, Aristotle’s contention remains a metaphysical statement, and hence is less suitable than Paul’s ‘prophetic’ alternative from Hebrews. The latter, Vattimo thinks, is a statement of weakening and of the message revealed in the incarnation of the Son of God. This message referred back to the prophets in the Old Testament, but also pointed forward to the Spirit speaking in many tongues at and after Pentecost (Acts 2). Vattimo uses this prophetic understanding of kenosis to challenge the idea of Wilhelm Dilthey’s that hermeneutics is a ‘general philosophy’ which grew out of the move away from metaphysical dogmatism. Instead, Vattimo uses kenosis to ground hermeneutics more fundamentally as a longstanding, archetypal tradition of the West. For Vattimo, ‘kenosis’ and ‘incarnation’ also reconfigure the relationship of the late-modern person to dogmatic thought, without overcoming it completely; it is a Verwindung rather than an Überwindung.

In other writings where Vattimo renews his focus on religion, Vattimo uses kenosis to refer to a process he calls ‘secularisation’. Through it, a message of weakening is passed down and weakens strong structures, including both the essence and the fulfilment of the Christian message. Vattimo invokes the notion of secularisation in Beyond Interpretation and in earlier writings, but without the precision he gives to the concept in Belief and After Christianity. In these later works, kenosis is the abasement of God. This can be understood as Him emptying himself of power and of otherness (Philippians 2:7), or as Christ calling humans to be friends rather than servants (John 15:15). Again utilising theological terms, Vattimo regards ‘salvation’ as reinterpreting Jesus’ words, and that we now feel free to reinterpret his words is evidence of salvation manifesting through history; the inauguration of the process of secularisation as weakening that occurred with kenosis has dissolved the strong structures (metaphysical, political, religious) that had restricted the possibilities of scriptural interpretation. Further weakening (for it is a process that never ends), Vattimo believes, occurs by weakening strong structures, living charitably and being open to others.

Vattimo draws upon the ideas of 12th century theologian Joachim of Fiore in this regard. Joachim saw history as divided into stages corresponding to the Trinity and the canon. The stage of the ‘Father’ pertained to the Old Testament, and this was about discipline. The stage of the ‘Son’ corresponded to the New Testament, and this was about the rise of the Church. Finally, the stage of the Spirit would eventually be a spiritual reading of scripture (one that rejects literalism and claims to objectivity) and greater interpretative freedom. Although Vattimo rejects literal prophecy as archaic, he is interested in a spiritual reading of scripture and doctrine. He sees the hermeneutics of the late-modern period as having a relationship to scripture and doctrine similar to the one Jesus has to the Old Testament: ‘you heard it was said…but I tell you…’ (Antitheses, Matthew 5). Indeed, Vattimo sees the hermeneutical nihilism of the postmodern era as the result of secularisation. That is, as the result of the kenosis of God that gradually liberates humanity from the myth of objectivity. On this issue, Vattimo relies heavily on the link between Jesus in Girard’s writing and the weakening of Being in Heidegger’s thought.

5. Ethics

Vattimo sees his philosophy of hermeneutical nihilism as having important ethical ramifications. As Vattimo claims that there are no facts, only interpretations, he opposes moral realism and any claim to objectivity in morals. Instead, Vattimo argues for an ‘ethics of finiteness’ which can be best summarised in the following passage from his recent work, A Farewell to Truth

[An ethic of finiteness should be] understood neither as the compulsion to leap into the void (much twentieth-century religious thought argues this line: acknowledgement of finiteness prepares the leap into faith, hence only a God can save us) nor as the definitive assumption of the alternatives concretely presented by the situation. An ethic of finiteness is one that strives to keep faith with the discovery of the always insuperable finite situatedness of one’s own provenance, while not forgetting the pluralistic implications of this discovery (Vattimo, 2011: 96).

Thus, in the face of nihilism, one should seek safety in the Other as expressed in the philosophies of Levinas or Derrida. On Vattimo’s view, these philosophers conceive of secularisation ‘as the fall in which God’s transcendence as the wholly other can be revealed through dialectical reversal’ (Vattimo, 2002: 37). Vattimo instead contends that one should acknowledge one’s situatedness, that of being a thrown project (we are born in a specific time, place, and with a particular background). The effect of this realisation should guard against strong thought. As he concedes in recent works, strong thought has in fact re-emerged in the late 20th and early 21st centuries. Vattimo’s ethics are therefore not normative in the conventional sense, but focus instead on encouraging the recognition of both one’s situatedness and the provisionality of one’s worldview.  Ethically, one should take a step backwards from one’s immediate situation. Although one’s cultural horizon constitutes the limit of thought, this does not entail outright moral relativism. One should be able to refrain from following the ethnic, cultural, religious or political principles local to one’s identity, since a lack of objective first principles does not warrant an immediate retreat into local rationalities. What is required is a disposition in accordance with the event of Being of the late modern, an the ability to step back from one’s immediate situation in order to take other people and their beliefs, values, and traditions into account.

In addition to stepping back from one’s immediate situation, the other main element of Vattimo’s ethics is the weakening of strong structures. Operating here is the influence of the traditionally Christian virtue of caritas (‘charity’), although Vattimo interprets this concept though his theory of ‘weak thought’. Vattimo sees caritas as the force driving secularisation, the application of the message of the kenosis of God through the interpretative act. Kenosis itself is an act of God showing his love for his creatures by emptying himself of his power and authority, and by calling us to be friends rather than servants. Indeed, it is possible to see caritas and kenosis as identical; kenosis is the message of the weakening of God, and caritas is the message of weakening as a formal principle. Imitating God is listening to the message of kenosis, of his weakening, and following it as if following a formal principle. In Vattimo’s case, the principle is of reducing violence by dissolving strong structures by interpreting and questioning them. As to whether caritas is itself metaphysical, Vattimo states that it ‘is not really ultimate and does not possess the peremptoriness of the metaphysical principle, which cannot be transcended’ (Vattimo, 1999: 64). Lacking the quality of being ‘ultimate’ is due paradoxically to caritas itself, since it is a principle of weakening. Its status as the kernel of revelation is guaranteed through Vattimo’s reading of kenosis as the heart of the New Testament, and his understanding of ‘love’ as God’s love shown through the message of his weakening.

For Vattimo caritas is the limit of secularisation. It is that which cannot be secularised and is the standard by which beliefs and practices should be judged when entering the secular public space. For instance, wearing the cross is not, Vattimo judges, offensive any longer because it has been secularised and is part of the cultural furniture of the West. However, the mindset involved in wearing the chador does not exhibit caritas as it is an example of strong thought. Those who wear or endorse the wearing of Islamic dress have not ‘read the signs of the times’, since the wearing of the chador is ‘an affirmation of a strong identity’ (Vattimo, 2002: 101). This mindset does not recognise the provisional nature and situatedness of its own provenance, nor does it accept the plurality of other views in the secular space of modern Europe. Therefore, Vattimo argues, it should not be legally permitted to express itself through such dress codes. Hence caritas prevents one from retreating into and cementing local identities in the absence of objective reality and objective values. However, Vattimo does not explore the possibility that the chador could be worn out of choice in a ‘weak’ sense.

Caritas rules out both specific normative positions and broader meta-ethical approaches. Concerning the latter, Vattimo is against anything that flouts ‘Hume’s law’ that one cannot derive an ‘ought’ from an ‘is’. The claim ‘torture is wrong’ can lead to ‘one should not torture’ only with the bridging statements ‘torture causes pain’ and ‘pain is wrong’. However, one must then explain why pain is wrong. Vattimo may well agree that one should minimise pain, but he would not do so on naturalistic grounds. This is because he does not believe that one can derive normative ethical prescriptions from rational observance of nature or eternal forms. Such a move would always entail that some people — such as Plato’s ‘philosopher kings’ — will claim authoritative knowledge of the link between nature and normativity. Vattimo justifies his approach in two ways. Firstly, he critiques the metaphysical nature of naturalistic meta-ethics. Secondly, he claims that the abuse of naturalistic ethics by elites is manifest in the position of the Catholic Church on sexual ethics (prohibition of homosexual acts and the use of artificial contraception) and medical or bio-ethics (prohibitions against euthanasia).

6. Political Philosophy

Vattimo was a Marxist during his youth. He eventually moved away from Marxism when he realised that some of his students’ metaphysical commitments were leading them to violent acts. This pushed him to develop his hermeneutics in the direction of weakening metaphysical strong structures of all forms, including Marxist commitments. Drawing upon the implications of hermeneutics for politics, Vattimo warns against specialists, technocrats, and any kind of leadership that presumes exclusive knowledge of the truth by which to lead a country. Likening these kinds of individuals to Plato’s philosopher kings, Vattimo sees any such form of governance as falling prey to the myth about objective truth. Rather, Vattimo argues, politics should be bounded by the cultural horizon of its time and place. In this sense, Vattimo consciously limits politics and politicians in the way Thomas Kuhn limited the claims of scientists with his ‘paradigm’ concept. Eternal forms and objective truths are replaced with provisional judgements. These are based on forms of life limited and constituted by cultural horizons and re-interpreted linguistic traditions.

Plato’s philosopher kings — the specialists, experts, and technocrats — can lead to totalitarianism, which Vattimo is keen to avoid. If the laws that run society were objective, Vattimo thinks that democracy would be an irrational choice. However, a ‘weak ontology’ or a ‘philosophy of weakening’ can provide reasons for preferring liberal democracy over totalitarianism. Vattimo relates totalitarian government to Heidegger’s ‘Ge-Stell’, and claims that within the Ge-Stell there is the first flashing-up of Ereignis. This aperture enables one to see that truth is not found in ‘presence’. Rather, it is based in historical events and the consensus formed within cultural horizons. Individuals can liberate themselves from facilitating government agendas through this realisation. Governments themselves can change through acknowledging the provisional and culturally-bound nature of thought. Although Vattimo aimed to move away from revolutionary violence, his justification of democracy over totalitarianism is particularly timely given the Arab Spring.

In recent years Vattimo has returned to a weakened Marxism, a form of Communism deeply informed by his philosophy of ‘weak thought’. Attempting to distance himself from the kind of Communism put into practice in the Soviet era, Vattimo claims that the problem with the traditional understanding of Marx is that his ideas have been framed metaphysically. Vattimo therefore looks to create a post-metaphysical Marxism. As with Catholicism, Vattimo realises one cannot overcome Marxism, but that it should be twisted. ‘Hermeneutic Communism’ is presented by Vattimo and his collaborator Santiago Zabala as an alternative to forms of liberal capitalism that aim to keep the status quo in favour of those benefitting from the system. Equally, they see it as an alternative to forms of Marxism that involve unilinear historicism.

7. References and Further Reading

The list of works by Vattimo is a non-exhaustive list, covering his major works in translation. Literature on Vattimo is growing. For works about Vattimo, the Benso and Zabala edited volumes are good places to start, covering a range of his work.

a. Works by Vattimo

  • The End of Modernity: Nihilism and Hermeneutics in Postmodern Culture. Trans. J. R. Snyder. Baltimore: John Hopkins University Press 1988a.
  • “Metaphysics, Violence, Secularisation.” Trans. B. Spackman. In Recoding Metaphysics: The New Italian Philosophy. Edited by G. Borradori. Evanston: Northwestern University Press 1988b, 45-61.
  • “Toward an Ontology of Decline Recoding Metaphysics.” Trans. B. Spackman. In Recoding Metaphysics: The New Italian Philosophy. Edited by G. Borradori. Evanston: Northwestern University Press 1988c.
  • The Transparent Society. Trans. D. Webb. Cambridge: Polity Press 1992.
  • The Adventure of Difference: Philosophy after Nietzsche and Heidegger. Trans. C. P. Blamires and T. Harrison. Cambridge: Polity Press 1993.
  • Beyond Interpretation: The Meaning of Hermeneutics for Philosophy. Trans. D. Webb. Cambridge: Polity Press, 1997.
  • With J. Derrida. Religion. Stanford: Stanford University Press 1998.
  • Belief. Trans. L. D’Isanto and D. Webb. Cambridge: Polity Press 1999.
  • Nietzsche: An Introduction. Trans. N. Martin. Stanford: Stanford University Press 2002.
  • After Christianity. Trans. L. D’Isanto. New York: Columbia University Press 2002.
  • Nihilism and Emancipation: Ethics, Politics, and Law. Foreword by Richard Rorty. Edited by Santiago Zabala and translated by William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press 2004.
  • With R. Rorty. The Future of Religion. Edited by Santiago Zabala. New York: Columbia University Press 2005.
  • Dialogue with Nietzsche. Trans. William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press 2006.
  • With John D. Caputo. After the Death of God. Edited by Jeffrey W. Robbins. New York: Columbia University Press 2007.
  • With Piergiorgio Paterlini. Not Being God: A Collaborative Autobiography. Trans. William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press 2009.
  • With René Girard. Christianity, Truth and Weakening Faith: A Dialogue. Edited by Pierpaolo Antonello. New York: Columbia University Press 2010.
  • The Responsibility of the Philosopher. Edited by Franca D’Agostini and translated by William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press 2010.
  • A Farewell to Truth. Trans. William McCuaig, with a foreword by Robert T. Valgenti. New York: Columbia University Press 2011.
  • With Santiago Zabala. Hermeneutic Communism: From Heidegger to Marx. New York and Chichester, West Sussex: Columbia University Press, 2011.

b. Works on Vattimo

  • Benso, S., Schroeder, B, eds. Between Nihilism and Politics: The Hermeneutics of Gianni Vattimo. New York: SUNY 2010.
  • Borradori, G. ““Weak Thought” and Postmodernism: The Italian Departure from Deconstruction.” Social Text 18 (Winter, 1987-1988), 39-49.
  • Depoortere, F. Christ in Postmodern Philosophy. London: T&T Clark 2008.
  • Guarino, T. Vattimo and Theology. New York: Continuum 2009.
  • Pireddu, Nicoletta. “Gianni Vattimo.” In Postmodernism, edited by Johannes Willem Bertene and Joseph P. Natoli. Boston: Blackwell 2002, 302-9.
  • Woodward, Ashley. “Nihilism and the Postmodern in Vattimo’s Nietzsche.” Minerva 6 (2002), 51-67.
  • Zabala, Santiago, ed. Weakening Philosophy: Essays in Honour of Gianni Vattimo. Montreal and Kingston, London, Ithaca: McGill-Queen’s University Press 2007.

c. Other Works Cited

  • Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari, eds. Nietzsche: Werke. Kritische Gesamtausgabe. Berlin and New York, 1967ff.


Author Information

Matthew Edward Harris
Email: h031781a@student.staffs.ac.uk
Staffordshire University
United Kingdom