Rudolf Carnap: Modal Logic

carnap02In two works, a paper in The Journal of Symbolic Logic in 1946 and the book Meaning and Necessity in 1947, Rudolf Carnap developed a modal predicate logic containing a necessity operator N, whose semantics depends on the claim that, where α is a formula of the language, Nα represents the proposition that α is logically necessary. Carnap’s view was that Nα should be true if and only if α itself is logically valid, or, as he put it, is L-true. In the light of the criticisms of modal logic developed by W.V. Quine from 1943 on, the challenge for Carnap was how to produce a theory of validity for modal predicate logic in a way which enables an answer to be given to these criticisms. This article discusses Carnap’s motivation for developing a modal logic in the first place; and it then looks at how the modal predicate logic developed in his 1946 paper might be adapted to answer Quine’s objections. The adaptation is then compared with the way in which Carnap himself tried to answer Quine’s complaints in the 1947 book. Particular attention is paid to the problem of how to treat the meaning of formulas which contain a free individual variable in the scope of a modal operator, that is, to the problem of how to handle what Quine called the third grade of ‘modal involvement’.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Carnap’s Propositional Modal Logic
  3. Carnap’s (Non-Modal) Predicate Logic
  4. Carnap’s 1946 Modal Predicate Logic
  5. De Re Modality
  6. Individual Concepts
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

In an important article (Carnap 1946) and in a book a year later, (Carnap 1947), Rudolf Carnap articulated a system of modal logic. Carnap took himself to be doing two things; the first was to develop an account of the meaning of modal expressions; the second was to extend it to apply to what he called “modal functional logic” — that is, what we would call modal predicate logic or modal first-order logic. Carnap distinguishes between a logic or a ‘semantical system’, and a ‘calculus’, which is an axiomatic system, and states on p. 33 of 1946 that  “So far, no forms of MFC [modal functional calculus] have been constructed, and the construction of such a system is our chief aim.” In fact, in the preceding issue of The Journal of Symbolic Logic, the first presentation of Ruth Barcan’s axiomatic systems of modal predicate logic had already appeared, although they contained only an axiomatic presentation. (Barcan 1946.) The principal importance of Carnap’s work is thus his attempt to produce a semantics for modal predicate logic, and it is that concern that this article will focus on.

Nevertheless, first-order logic is founded on propositional logic, and Carnap first looks at non-modal propositional logic and modal propositional logic. I shall follow Carnap in using ~ and ∨ for negation and disjunction, though I shall use ∧ in place of Carnap’s ‘.’ for conjunction. Carnap takes these as primitive together with ‘t’ which stands for an arbitrary tautologous sentence. He recognises that ∧ and t can be defined in terms of ~ and ∨, but prefers to take them as primitive because of the importance to his presentation of conjunctive normal form. Carnap adopts the standard definitions of ⊃ and ≡. I will, however, deviate from Carnap’s notation by using Greek in place of German letters for metalinguistic symbols. In place of ‘valid’ Carnap speaks of L-true, and in place of ‘unsatisfiable’, L-false. α L-implies β iff (if and only if) α ⊃ β is valid. α and β are L-equivalent iff α ≡ β is valid.

One might at this stage ask what led Carnap to develop a modal logic at all. The clue here seems to be the influence of Wittgenstein. In his philosophical autobiography Carnap writes:

For me personally, Wittgenstein was perhaps the philosopher who, besides Russell and Frege, had the greatest influence on my thinking. The most important insight I gained from his work was the conception that the truth of logical statements is based only on their logical structure and on the meaning of the terms. Logical statements are true under all conceivable circumstances; thus their truth is independent of the contingent facts of the world. On the other hand, it follows that these statements do not say anything about the world and thus have no factual content. (Carnap 1963, p. 25)

Wittgenstein’s account of logical truth depended on the view that every (cognitively meaningful) sentence has truth conditions. (Wittgenstein 1921, 4.024.) Carnap certainly appears to have taken Wittgenstein’s remark as endorsing the truth-conditional theory of meaning. (See for instance Carnap 1947 p. 9.) If all logical truths are tautologies, and all tautologies are contentless, then you don’t need metaphysics to explain (logical) necessity.

One of the features of Wittgenstein’s view was that any way the world could be is determined by a collection of particular facts, where each such fact occupies a definite position in logical space, and where the way that position is occupied is independent of the way any other position of logical space is occupied. Such a world may be described in a logically perfect language, in which each atomic formula describes how a position of logical space is occupied. So suppose that we begin with this language, and instead of asking whether it reflects the structure of the world, we ask whether it is a useful language for describing the world. From Carnap’s perspective, (Carnap 1950) one might describe it in such a way as this. Given a language £ we may ask whether £ is adequate, or perhaps merely useful, for describing the world as we experience it. It is incoherent to speak about what the world in itself is like without presupposing that one is describing it. What makes £ a Carnapian equivalent of a logically perfect language would be that each of its atomic sentences is logically independent of any other atomic sentence, and that every possible world can be described by a state-description.

2. Carnap’s Propositional Modal Logic

In (non-modal) propositional logic the truth value of any well-formed formula (wff) is determined by an assignment of truth values to the atomic sentences. For Carnap an assignment of truth values to the atomic sentences is represented by what he calls a ‘state-description’. This term, like much in what follows, is only introduced at the predicate level (1946, p. 50) but it is less confusing to present it first for the propositional case, where a state-description, which I will refer to as s, is a class consisting of atomic wff or their negations, such that for each atomic wff p, exactly one of p or ~p is in s. (Here we may think of p as a propositional variable, or as a metalinguistic variable standing for an atomic wff.) Armed with a state-description s we may determine the truth of a wff α at s in the usual way, where s ╞ α means that α is true according to s, and s ╡ α means that not s ╞ α:

If α is atomic, then s ╞ α if α ∈ s, and s ╡ α if ~α ∈ s

s ╞ ~α iff s ╡ α

s ╞ α ∨ β iff s ╞ α or s ╞ β

s ╞ α ∧ β iff s ╞ α and s ╞ β

s ╞ t

This is not the way Carnap describes it. Carnap speaks of the range of a wff (p. 50). In Carnap’s terms the truth rules would be written:

If α is atomic then the range of α is those state-descriptions s such that α ∈ s.

Where V is the set of all state-descriptions, the range of ~α is V minus the range of α, that is, it is the class of those state-descriptions which are not in the range of α.

The range of α ∨ β is the range of α ∪ the range of β, that is, the class of state-descriptions which are either in the range of α or the range of β.

The range of α ∧ β is the range of α ∩ the range of β, that is, the class of state-descriptions which are in both the range of α and the range of β.

The range of t is V.

It should I hope be easy to see, first that Carnap’s way of putting things is equivalent to my use of s ╞ α, and second that these are in turn equivalent to the standard definitions of validity in terms of assignments of truth values.

By a ‘calculus’ Carnap means an axiomatic system, and he uses ‘PC’ to indicate any axiomatic system which is closed under modus ponens (the ‘rule of implication’, p. 38) and contains “‘t’ and all sentences formed by substitution from Bernays’s four axioms [See Hilbert and Ackermann, 1950, p. 28f] of the propositional calculus”. (loc cit.) Carnap notes that the soundness of this axiom system may be established in the usual way, and then shows how the possibility of reduction to conjunctive normal form (a method which Carnap, p. 38, calls P-reduction) may be used to prove completeness.

Modal logic is obtained by the addition of the sentential operator N. Carnap notes that N is equivalent to Lewis’s ~◊~. (Note that the □ symbol was not used by Lewis, but was invented by F.B. Fitch in 1945, and first appeared in print in Barcan 1946. It was not then known to Carnap.) Carnap tells us early in his article that “the guiding idea in our construction of systems of modal logic is this: a proposition p is logically necessary if and only if a sentence expressing p is logically true.” When this is turned into a definition in terms of truth in a state-description we get the following:

sNα iff sʹ ╞ α for every state-description sʹ.

This is because L-truth, or validity, means truth in every state-description. I shall refer to validity when N is interpreted in this way, as Carnap-validity, or C-validity. This account enables Carnap to address what was an important question at the time — what is the correct system of modal logic? While Carnap is clear that different systems of modal logic can reflect different views of the meaning of the necessity operators he is equally clear that, as he understands it, principles like NpNNp and ~NpN~Np are valid. It is easy to see that the validity of both these formulae follows easily from Carnap’s semantics for N. From this it is a short step to establishing that Carnap’s modal logic includes the principles of Lewis’s system S5, provided one takes the atomic wff to be propositional variables. However, we immediately run into a problem. Suppose that p is an atomic wff. Then there will be a state-description sʹ such that ~psʹ. And this means that for every state-description s, sNp, and so s ╞ ~Np. But this means that ~Np will be L-true. One can certainly have a system of modal logic in which this is so. An axiomatic basis and a completeness proof for the logic of C-validity occurs in Thomason 1973. (For comments on this feature of C-validity see also Makinson 1966 and Schurz 2001.) However, Carnap is clear that his system is equivalent to S5 (footnote 8, p. 41, and on p. 46.); and ~Np is not a theorem of S5. Further, the completeness theorem that Carnap proves, using normal forms, is a completeness proof for S5, based on Wajsberg 1933.

How then should this problem be addressed? Part of the answer is to look at Carnap’s attitude to propositional variables:

We here make use of ‘p’, ‘q’, and so forth, as auxiliary variables; that is to say they are merely used (following Quine) for the description of certain forms of sentences. (1946, p.41)

Quine 1934 suggests that the theorems of logic are always schemata. If so then we can define a wff α as what we might call QC-valid (Quine/Carnap valid) iff every substitution instance of α is C-valid. Wffs which are QC-valid are precisely the theorems of S5.

3. Carnap’s (Non-Modal) Predicate Logic

In presenting Carnap’s 1946 predicate logic (or as he prefers to call it ‘functional logic’, FL or FC depending on whether we are considering it semantically or axiomatically) I shall use ∀x in place of (x), and ∃x in place of (∃x). FL contains a denumerable infinity of individual constants, which I will often refer to simply as ‘constants’. Carnap uses the term ‘matrix’ for wff, and the term ‘sentence’ for closed wff, that is wff with no free variables. A state-description is as for propositional logic in containing only atomic sentences or their negations. Each of these will be a wff of the form or, where P is an n-place predicate and a1,..., an are n individual constants, not necessarily distinct.

To define truth in such a state-description Carnap proceeds a little differently from what is now common. In place of relativising the truth of an open formula to an assignment to the variables of individuals from a domain, Carnap assumes that every individual is denoted by one and only one individual constant, and he only defines truth for sentences. If s is any state-description, and α and β are any sentences, the rules for propositional modal logic can be extended by adding the following: if Pa1...ans and if ~Pa1...ans

sa = b iff a and b are the same constant

s ╞ ∀xα iff s ╞ α[a/x] for every constant a, where [α/x] is α with a replacing every free x.

Carnap produces the following axiomatic basis for first-order predicate logic, which he calls ‘FC’. In place of Carnap’s ( ) to indicate the universal closure of a wff, I shall use ∀, so that Carnap’s D8-1a (1946, p. 52) can be written as:

PC       ∀α where α is a PC-tautology

and so on. Carnap refers to axioms as ‘primitive sentences’ and in addition to PC, using more current names, we have:

       ∀(∀x(α ⊃ β) ⊃ (∀xα ⊃ ∀xβ))

VQ      ∀(α ⊃ ∀xα), where x is not free in α.

∀1a     ∀(∀x ⊃ α[y/x]), where α[y/x] is just like α except in having y in place of free x, where y is any variable for which x is free

∀1b     ∀(∀x ⊃ α[b/x]), where α[b/x] is just like α except in having b in place of free x, where b is any constant

I1         ∀x x = x

I2         ∀(x = y ⊃ (α ⊃ β)), where α and β are alike except that α has free x in 0 or more places where β has free y.

I3         ab where a and b are different constants.

The only transformation rule is modus ponens:

MP      ├ α, ├ α ⊃ β therefore ├ β

The only thing non-standard here, except perhaps for the restriction of theorems to closed wffs, is I3, which ensures that all state-descriptions are infinite, and, as Carnap points out on p. 53, validates ∃xy xy. It is possible to prove the completeness of this axiomatic system with respect to Carnap’s semantics.

4. Carnap’s 1946 Modal Predicate Logic

Perhaps the most important issue in Carnap’s modal logic is its connection with the criticisms of W.V. Quine. These criticisms were well known to Carnap who cites Quine 1943. Some years later, in Quine 1953b, Quine distinguishes three grades of what he calls ‘modal involvement’. The first grade he regards as innocuous. It is no more than the metalinguistic attribution of validity to a formula of non-modal logic. In the second grade we say that where α is any sentence then Nα is true iff α itself is valid — or logically true. On pp. 166-169 Quine argues that while such a procedure is possible it is unilluminating and misleading. The third grade applies to modal predicate logic, and allows free individual variables to occur in the scope of modal operators. It is this grade that Quine finds objectionable. One of the points at issue between Quine and Carnap arises when we introduce what are called definite descriptions into the language. Much of Carnap’s discussion in his other works — see especially Carnap 1947 — elevates descriptions to a central role, but in the 1946 paper these are not involved.

The extension of Carnap’s semantics to modal logic is exactly as in the propositional case:

sNα iff sʹ ╞ α for every state-description sʹ.

As before, a wff can be called C-valid iff it is true in every state-description, when ╞ satisfies the principle just stated. As in the propositional case if α is S5-valid then α is C-valid. However, also as in the propositional case, (quantified) S5 is not complete for C-validity. This is because, where Pa is an atomic wff, ~NPa is C-valid even though it is not a theorem of S5 — and similarly with any atomic wff. Unlike the propositional case it seems that this is a feature which Carnap welcomed in the predicate case, since he introduces some non-standard axioms.

The first set of axioms all form part of a standard basis for S5. They are as follows (p. 54, but with current names and notation):

LPCN  Where α is one of the LPC axioms PC-I3 then both α and Nα are axioms of MFC.

K         N∀(N(α ⊃ β) ⊃ (Nα ⊃ Nβ))

T         ∀(Nα ⊃ α)

5          N∀(Nα ∨ N~Nα)

BFC     N∀(Nxα ⊃ ∀xNα)

BF       N∀(∀xNα ⊃ Nxα)

The non-standard axioms, which show that he is attempting to axiomatise C-validity, are what Carnap calls ‘Assimilation’, ‘Variation and Generalization’ and ‘Substitution for Predicates’. (Carnap 1946, p. 54f.) In our notation these can be expressed as follows:

Ass      Nxyz1...∀zn((xz1 ∧ ... ∧ xzn) ⊃ (Nα ⊃ N α[y/x])), where α contains no free variables other than x, y, z1,..., zn, and no constants and no occurrences of =.

VG      Nxyz1...∀zn((xz1 ∧ ... ∧ xznyz1 ∧ ... ∧ yzn) ⊃ (Nα ⊃ N α[y/x]), where α contains no free variables other than x, y, z1,..., zn, and no constants.

SP       N∀(Nα ⊃ Nβ), where β is obtained from α by uniform substitution of a complex expression for a predicate.

None of these axiom schemata is easy to process, but it is not difficult to see what the simplest instances would look like. A very simple instance, which is of both Ass and VG is

AssP     Nxyz(xz ⊃ (NPxyzNPyyz))

To establish the validity of AssP it is sufficient to show that if a and c are distinct constants then NPabcNPbbc is valid. This is trivially so, since there is some s such that sPabc, and therefore for every s, sNPabc, and so, for every s, sNPabcPbbc. More telling is the case of SP. Let P be a one-place predicate and consider

SPP      Nx(NPxN(Px ∧ ~Px))

In this case α is Px, while β is Px ∧ ~Px, so that, in Carnap’s words, β ‘is formed from α by replacing every atomic matrix containing P by the current substitution form of β’. That is, where β is Px ∧ ~Px, it replaces α’s Px. If α had been more complex and contained Py as well as Px, then the replacement would have given Py ∧ ~ Py, and so on, where care needs to be taken to prevent any free variable being bound as a result of the replacement. In this case we have ├ ~N(Pa ∧ ~ Pa), and so ├ ~NPa.

In fact, although Carnap appears to have it in mind to axiomatise C-validity, it is easy to see that the predicate version is not recursively axiomatisable. For, where α is any LPC wff, α is not LPC-valid iff ~Nα is C-valid, and so, if C-validity were axiomatisable then LPC would be decidable. There is a hint on p. 57 that Carnap may have recognised this. He is certainly aware that the kind of reduction to normal form, with which he achieves the completeness of propositional S5, is unavailable in the predicate case, since it would lead to the decidability of LPC.

5. De Re Modality

What then can be said on the basis of Carnap 1946 to answer Quine’s complaints about modal predicate logic? Quine illustrates the problem in Quine 1943, pp. 119-121, and repeats versions of his argument many times, most famously perhaps in Quine 1953a, 1953b and 1960. The example  goes like this:

(1)                                9 is necessarily greater than 7

(2)                                The number of planets = 9


(3)                                The number of planets is necessarily greater than 7.

Carnap 1946 does not introduce definite descriptions into the language, so I shall present the argument in a formalisation which only uses the resources found there. I shall also simplify the discussion by using the predicate O, where Ox means ‘x is odd’, rather than the complex predicate ‘is greater than 7’. This will avoid reference to ‘7’, which is of no relevance to Quine’s argument. P means ‘is the number of the planets’, so that Px means ‘there are x-many planets’. With this in mind I take ‘9’ to be an individual constant, and use O and P to express (1) and (2) by

(4)                                NO9

(5)                                ∃x(Pxx = 9)

One could account for (4) by adding O9 as a meaning postulate in the sense of Carnap 1952, which would restrict the allowable state-descriptions to those which contain O9, though from some remarks on p. 201 of Carnap 1947 it seems that Carnap might have regarded both O and 9 as complex expressions defined by the resources of the Frege/Russell account of the natural numbers and their arithmetical properties. It also seems that he might have treated the numbers as higher-order entities referred to by higher-order expressions. If so then the necessity of arithmetical truths like (4) would derive from their analysis into logical truths. In my exposition I shall take the numerals as individual constants, and assume somehow that O9 is a logical truth, true in every state-description, and that therefore (4) is true.

In this formalisation I am ignoring the claim that the description ‘the number of the planets’ is intended to claim that there is only one such number. So much for the premises. But what about the conclusion? The problem is where to put the N. There are at least three possibilities:

(6)                                Nx(PxOx)

(7)                                ∃xN(PxOx)

(8)                                ∃x(PxNOx)

It is not difficult to show that (6) and (7) do not follow from (4) and (5). In contrast to (6) and (7), (8) does follow from (4) and (5), but there is no problem here, since (8) says that there is a necessarily odd number which is such that there happen to be that many planets. And this is true, because 9 is necessarily odd, and there are 9 planets. All of this should make clear how the phenomenon which upset Quine can be presented in the formal language of the 1946 article. Quine of course claims not to make sense of quantifying in. (See for instance the comments on Smullyan 1948 in Quine 1969, p. 338.)

6. Individual Concepts

Even if something like what has just been said might be thought to enable Carnap to answer Quine’s complaints about de re modality, it seems clear that Carnap had not availed himself of it in the 1947 book, and I shall now look at the modal logic presented in Carnap 1947. On p. 193f Carnap cites the argument (1)(2)(3) from Quine 1943 discussed above. He does not appear to recognise any potential ambiguity in the conclusion, and characterises (3) as false. Carnap doesn’t consider (8), and on p. 194 simply says:

“we obtain the false statement [(3)]”

In Carnap’s view the problem with Quine’s argument is that it assumes an unrestricted version of what is sometimes called ‘Leibniz’ Law’:

I2         ∀xy(x = y ⊃ (α ⊃ β)), where α and β differ only in that α has free x in 0 or more places where β has free y.

In the 1946 paper this law holds in full generality, as does a consequence of it which asserts the necessity of true identities.

LI        ∀xy(x = yNx = y)

For suppose LI fails. Then there would have to be a state-description ss in which for some constants a and b, sa = b but sNa = b. So there is a state-description sʹ such that sʹ ╡ a = b, but then, a and b are different constants, and so, sa = b, which gives a contradiction.

In the 1947 book Carnap holds that I2 must be restricted so that neither x nor y occur free in the scope of a modal operator. In particular the following would be ruled out as an allowable instance of I2:

(1)                                x = y ⊃ (NOxNOy)

In order to explain how this failure comes about, and solve the problems posed by co-referring singular terms, Carnap modifies the semantics of the 1946 paper. The principal difference from the modal logic of the 1946 paper, as Carnap tells us on p. 183, is that the domain of quantification for individual variables now consists of individual concepts, where an individual concept i is a function from state-descriptions to individual constants. Where s is a state-description, let is denote the constant which is the value of the function i for the state-description s. Carnap is clear that the quantifiers range over all individual concepts, not just those expressible in the language.

Using this semantics it is easy to see how (9) can fail. For let x have as its value the individual concept i, which is the function such that is is 9 for every state-description s, while the value of y is the function j such that, in any state-description s, js is the individual which is the number of the planets in s, that is, js is the (unique) constant a such that Pa is in s. (Assume that in each state-description there is a unique number, possibly 0, which satisfies P.) Assume that x = y is true in any state-description s iff, where i is the individual concept which is the value of x, and j is the individual concept which is the value of y, then is is the same individual constant as js. In the present example it happens that when s is the state-description which represents the actual world, is and js are indeed the same, for in s there are nine planets, making x = y true at s. Now NOx will be true if Ox is true in every state-description sʹ, which is to say if isʹ satisfies O in every sʹ. Since isʹ is 9 in every state-description then isʹ does satisfy O in every sʹ, and so NOx is true at s. But suppose sʹ represents a situation in which there are six planets. Then jsʹ will be 6 and so Oy will be false in sʹ, and for that reason NOy will be false in s, thus falsifying (9). (It is also easy to see that LI is not valid, since it is easy to have is = js even though ij.)

The difference between the modal semantics of Carnap 1946 and Carnap 1947 is that in the former the only individuals are the genuine individuals, represented by the constants of the language ℒ. In the proof of the invalidity of (9) it is essential that the semantics of identity require that when x is assigned an individual concept i and y is assigned an individual concept j that x = y be true at a state-description s iff is and js are the same individual. And now we come to Quine’s complaint (Quine 1953a, p. 152f). It is that Carnap replaces the domain of things as the range of the quantifiers with a domain of individual concepts. Quine then points out that the very same paradoxes arise again at the level of individual concepts. Thus for instance it might be that the individual concept which represents the number of planets in each state-description is identical with the first individual concept introduced on p. 193 of Meaning and Necessity. Carnap is alive to Quine’s criticism that ordinary individuals have been replaced in his ontology by individual concepts. In essence Carnap’s reply to Quine on pp. 198- 200 of Carnap 1947 is that if we restrict ourselves to purely extensional contexts then the entities which enter into the semantics are precisely the same entities as are the extensions of the intensions involved. What this amounts to is that although the domain of quantification consists of individual concepts, the arguments of the predicates are only the genuine individuals. For suppose, as Quine appears to have in mind, we permit predicates which apply to individual concepts. Then suppose that i and j are distinct individual concepts. Let P be a predicate which can apply to individual concepts, and let s be a state-description in which P applies to i but not to j but in which is and js are the same individual. We now have two options depending on how = is to be understood. If we take x = y to be true in s when is and js are the same individual then if x is assigned i and y is assigned j we would have that x = y and Px are both true in s, but Py is not. So that even the simplest instance of I2

I2P       x = y ⊃ (PxPy)

fails, and here there are no modal operators involved. The second option is to treat = as expressing a genuine identity. That is to say x = y is true only when the individual concept assigned to x is the same individual concept as the one assigned to y. In the example I have been discussing, since i and j are distinct individual concepts if i is assigned to x and j to y, then x = y will be false. But on this option the full version of I2 becomes valid even when α and β contain modal operators. This is just another version of Quine’s complaint that if an operator expresses identity then the terms of a true identity formula must be interchangeable in all contexts. Presumably Carnap thought that the use of individual concepts could address these worries. The present article makes no claims on whether or not an acceptable treatment of individual concepts is desirable, and if it is whether one can be developed.

7. References and Further Reading

This list contains all items referred to in the text, together with some other articles relevant to Carnap’s modal logic.

  • Barcan, (Marcus) R.C., 1946, A functional calculus of first order based on strict implication. The Journal of Symbolic Logic, 11, 1–16.
  • Burgess, J.P., 1999, Which modal logic is the right one? Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 40, 81–93.
  • Carnap, R., 1937, The Logical Syntax of Language, London, Kegan Paul, Trench Truber.
  • Carnap, R., 1946, Modalities and quantification. The Journal of Symbolic Logic, 11, 33–64.
  • Carnap, R., 1947, Meaning and Necessity, Chicago, University of Chicago Press (Second edition 1956, references are to the second edition.).
  • Carnap, R., 1950, Empiricism, semantics and ontology. Revue Intern de Phil. 4, pp. 20–40 (Reprinted in the second edition of Carnap 1947, pp. 2052–2221. Page references are to this reprint.).
  • Carnap, R., 1952, Meaning postulates. Philosophical Studies, 3, pp. 65–73. (Reprinted in the second edition of Carnap 1947, pp. 222–229. Page references are to this reprint.)
  • Carnap, R., 1963, The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, ed P.A. Schilpp, La Salle, Ill., Open Court, pp. 3–84.
  • Church, A., 1973, A revised formulation of the logic of sense and denotation (part I). Noũs, 7, pp. 24–33.
  • Cocchiarella, N.B., 1975a, On the primary and secondary semantics of logical necessity. Journal of Philosophical Logic, 4, pp. 13–27..
  • Cocchiarella, N.B.,1975b, Logical atomism, nominalism, and modal logic. Synthese, 31, pp. 23−67.
  • Cresswell, M.J., 2013, Carnap and McKinsey: Topics in the pre–history of possible worlds semantics. Proceedings of the 12th Asian Logic Conference, J. Brendle, R. Downey, R. Goldblatt and B. Kim (eds), World Scientific, pp. 53-75.
  • Garson, J.W., 1980, Quantification in modal logic. Handbook of Philosophical Logic, ed. D.M. Gabbay and F. Guenthner, Dordrecht, Reidel, Vol. II, Ch. 5, 249-307
  • Gottlob, G., 1999, Remarks on a Carnapian extension of S5. In J. Wolenski, E. Köhler (eds.), Alfred Tarski and the Vienna Circle, Kluwer, Dordrecht, 243−259.
  • Hilbert, D., and W. Ackermann, 1950, Mathematical Logic, New York, Chelsea Publishing Co., (Translation of Grundzüge der Theoretischen Logik.).
  • Hughes, G.E., and M.J. Cresswell, 1996, A New Introduction to Modal Logic, London, Routledge.
  • Lewis, C.I., and C.H. Langford, 1932, Symbolic Logic, New York, Dover publications.
  • Makinson, D., 1966, How meaningful are modal operators? Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 44, 331−337.
  • Quine, W.V.O., 1934, Ontological remarks on the propositional calculus. Mind, 433, pp. 473– 476.
  • Quine, W.V.O., 1943, Notes on existence and necessity, The Journal of Philosophy, Vol 40, pp. 113-127.
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Author Information

M. J. Cresswell
Victoria University of Wellington
New Zealand

Differential Ontology

Differential ontology approaches the nature of identity by explicitly formulating a concept of difference as foundational and constitutive, rather than thinking of difference as merely an observable relation between entities, the identities of which are already established or known. Intuitively, we speak of difference in empirical terms, as though it is a contrast between two things; a way in which a thing, A, is not like another thing, B. To speak of difference in this colloquial way, however, requires that A and B each has its own self-contained nature, articulated (or at least articulable) on its own, apart from any other thing. The essentialist tradition, in contrast to the tradition of differential ontology, attempts to locate the identity of any given thing in some essential properties or self-contained identities, and it occupies, in one form or another, nearly all of the history of philosophy. Differential ontology, however, understands the identity of any given thing as constituted on the basis of the ever-changing nexus of relations in which it is found, and thus, identity is a secondary determination, while difference, or the constitutive relations that make up identities, is primary. Therefore, if philosophy wishes to adhere to its traditional, pre-Aristotelian project of arriving at the most basic, fundamental understanding of things, perhaps its target will need to be concepts not rooted in identity, but in difference.

“Differential ontology” is a term that may be applied particularly to the works and ideas of Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze. Their successors have extended their work into cinema studies, ethics, theology, technology, politics, the arts, and animal ethics, among others.

This article consists of three main sections. The first explores a brief history of the problem. The historical emergence of the problem in ancient Greek philosophy reveals not only the dangers of a philosophy of difference, but also demonstrates that it is a philosophical problem that is central to the nature of philosophy as such, and is as old as philosophy itself. The second section explores some of the common themes and concerns of differential ontology. The third section discusses differential ontology through the specific lenses of Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze.

Table of Contents

  1. The Origins of the Philosophy of Difference in Ancient Greek Philosophy
    1. Heraclitus
    2. Parmenides
    3. Plato
    4. Aristotle
  2. Key Themes of Differential Ontology
    1. Immanence
    2. Time as Differential
    3. Critique of Essentialist Metaphysics
  3. Key Differential Ontologists
    1. Jacques Derrida as a Differential Ontologist
    2. Gilles Deleuze as a Differential Ontologist
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Other Sources Cited in this Article

1. The Origins of the Philosophy of Difference in Ancient Greek Philosophy

Although the concept of differential ontology is applied specifically to Derrida and Deleuze, the problem of difference is as old as philosophy itself. Its precursors lie in the philosophies of Heraclitus and Parmenides, it is made explicit in Plato and deliberately shut down in Aristotle, remaining so for some two and a half millennia before being raised again, and turned into an explicit object of thought, by Derrida and Deleuze in the middle of the twentieth century.

a. Heraclitus

From its earliest beginnings, what distinguishes ancient Greek philosophy from a mythologically oriented worldview is philosophy’s attempt to offer a rationally unified picture of the operations of the universe, rather than a cosmos subject to the fleeting and conflicting whims of various deities, differing from humans only in virtue of their power and immortality. The early Milesian philosophers, for instance, had each sought to locate among the various primitive elements a first principle (or archê). Thales had argued that water was the primary principle of all things, while Anaximenes had argued for air. Through various processes and permutations (or in the case of Anaximenes, rarefaction and condensation), this first principle assumes the forms of the various other elements with which we are familiar, and of which the cosmos is comprised. All things come from this primary principle, and eventually, they return to it.

Against such thinkers, Heraclitus of Ephesus (fl. c.500 BCE) argues that fire is the first principle of the cosmos: “The cosmos, the same for all, no god or man made, but it always was, is, and will be, an everlasting fire, being kindled in measures and put out in measures.” (DK22B30) From this passage, we are able to glean a few things. The most obvious divergence is that Heraclitus names fire as the basic element, rather than water, air, or, in the case of Anaximander, the boundless (apeiron). But secondly, unlike the Milesians, Heraclitus does not hold in favor of any would-be origin of the cosmos. The universe always was and always will be this self-manifesting, self-quenching, primordial fire, expressed in nature’s limitless ways. So while fire, for Heraclitus, may be ontologically basic in some sense, it is not temporally basic or primordial: it did not, in the temporal or sequential order of things, come first.

However, like his Milesian predecessors, Heraclitus appears to provide at least a basic account for how fire as first principle transforms: “The turnings of fire: first sea, and of sea, half is earth, half lightning flash.” (DK22B31a) Elsewhere we can see more clearly that fire has ontological priority only in a very limited sense for Heraclitus: “The death of earth is to become water, and the death of water is to become air, and the death of air is to become fire, and reversely.” (DK22B76) Earth becomes water; water becomes air; air becomes fire, and reversely. Combined with the two passages above, we can see that the ontological priority of fire is its transformative power. Fire from the sky consumes water, which later falls from the sky nourishing the earth. Likewise, fire underlies water (which in its greatest accumulations rages and howls as violently as flame itself), out of which comes earth and the meteorological or ethereal activity itself. Thus we can see the greatest point of divergence between Heraclitus and his Milesian forbears: the first principle of Heraclitus is not a substance. Fire, though one of the classical elements, is of its very nature a dynamic element—a vital element that is nothing more than its own transformation. It creates (volcanoes produce land masses; furnaces temper steel; heat cooks our food and keeps us safe from elemental exposure), but it also destroys in countless obvious ways; it hardens and strengthens, just as it weakens and consumes. Fire, then, is not an element in the sense of a thing, but more as a process. In contemporary scientific terms, we would say that it is the result of a chemical reaction, its essence for Heraclitus lies in its obvious dynamism. When we look at things (like tables, trees, homes, people, and so forth), they seem to exemplify a permanence which is saliently missing from our experience of fire.

This brings us to the next point: things, for Heraclitus, only appear to have permanence; or rather, their permanence is a result of the processes that make up the identities of the things in question. Here it is appropriate to cite the famous river example, found in more than one Heraclitean fragment: “You cannot step twice into the same rivers; for fresh waters are flowing in upon you.” (DK22B12) “We step and do not step into the same rivers; we are and are not.” (DK22B49a) These passages highlight the seemingly paradoxical nature of the cosmos. On the one hand, of course there is a meaningful sense in which one may step twice into the same river; one may wade in, wade back out, then walk back in again; this body of water is marked between the same banks, the same land markers, and the same flow of water, and so forth. But therein lies the paradox: the water that one waded into the first time is now completely gone, having been replaced by an entirely new configuration of particles of water. So there is also a meaningful sense in which one cannot step into the same river twice. But it is this particular flowing that makes this river this river, and nothing else. Its identity, therefore (as also my own identity), is an effervescent impermanence, constituted on the basis of the flows that make it up. We peer into nature and see things—rivers, people, animals, and so forth—but these are only temporary constitutions, even deceptions: “Men are deceived in their knowledge of things that are manifest.” (DK22B56) The true nature of nature itself, however, continuously eludes us: “Nature tends to conceal itself.” (DK22B123)

The paradoxical nature of things, (that their identities are constituted on the basis of processes), helps us to make sense of Heraclitus’ proclamation of the unity of opposites, (which both Plato and Aristotle held to be unacceptable). Fire is vital and powerful, raging beneath the appearances of nature like a primordial ontological state of warfare: “War is the father of all and the king of all.” (DK22B53) The very same process-driven nature of things that makes a thing what it is by the same operations tends toward the thing’s undoing as well. As we saw, fire is responsible for the opposite and complementary functions of both creativity and destruction. The nature of things is to tend toward their own undoing and eventual passage into their opposites: “What opposes unites, and the finest attunement stems from things bearing in opposite directions, and all things come about by strife.” (DK22B8).

It is in this sense that all things are, for Heraclitus, one. The creative-destructive operations of nature underlie all of its various expressions, binding the whole of the cosmos together in accordance with a rational principle of organization, recognized only in the universal and timeless truth that everything is constantly subject to the law of flux and impermanence: “It is wise to hearken, not to me, but to the Word [logos—otherwise translatable as reason, argument, rational principle, and so forth], and to confess that all things are one.” (DK22B50). Thus it is that Heraclitus is known as the great thinker of becoming or flux. The being of the cosmos, the most essential fact of its nature, lies in its becoming; its only permanence is its impermanence. For our purposes, we can say that Heraclitus was the first philosopher of difference. Where his predecessors had sought to identify the one primordial, self-identical substance or element, out of which all others had emerged, Heraclitus had attempted to think the world, nothing more than the world, in a permanent state (if this is not too paradoxical) of flux.

b. Parmenides

Parmenides (b. 510 BCE) was likely a young man at the time when Heraclitus was philosophically active. Born in Elea, in Lower Italy, Parmenides’ name is the one most commonly associated with Eleatic monism. While (ironically) there is no one standard interpretation of Eleatic monism, probably the most common understanding of Parmenides is filtered through our familiarity with the paradoxes of his successor, Zeno, who argued, in defense of Parmenides, that what we humans perceive as motion and change are mere illusions.

Against this backdrop, what we know of Parmenides’ views come to us from his didactic poem, titled On Nature, which now exists in only fragmentary form. Here, however, we find Parmenides, almost explicitly objecting to Heraclitus: “It is necessary to say and to think that being is; for it is to be/but it is by no means nothing. These things I bid you ponder./For from this first path of inquiry, I bar you./then yet again from that along which mortals who know nothing/wander two-headed: for haplessness in their/breasts directs wandering understanding. They are borne along/deaf and blind at once, bedazzled, undiscriminating hordes,/who have supposed that being and not-being are the same/and not the same; but the path of all is back-turning.” (DK28B6) There are a couple of important things to note here. First, the mention of those who suppose that being and not-being are the same and not the same hearkens almost explicitly to Heraclitus’ notion of the unity of opposites. Secondly, Parmenides declares this to be the opinion of the undiscriminating hordes, the masses of non-philosophically-minded mortals.

Therefore, Heraclitus, on Parmenides’ view, does not provide a philosophical account of being; rather, he simply coats in philosophical language the everyday experience of the mob. Against Heraclitus’ critical diagnosis that humans (deceptively) see only permanent things, Parmenides claims that permanence is precisely what most people, Heraclitus included, miss, preoccupied as we are with the mundane comings and goings of the latest trends, fashions, and political currents. The being of the cosmos lies not in its becoming, as Heraclitus thought. Becoming is nothing more than an illusion, the perceptions of mortal minds. What is, for Parmenides, is and cannot not be, while what is not, is not, and cannot be. Neither is it possible to even think of what is not, for to think of anything entails that it must be an object of thought. Thus to meditate on something that is not an object is, for Parmenides, contradictory. Therefore, “for the same thing is for thinking and for being.” (DK28B3)

Being is indivisible; for in order to divide being from itself, one would have to separate being from being by way of something else, either being or not-being. But not-being is not and cannot be, (so not-being cannot separate being from being). And if being is separated from being by way of being, then being itself in this thought-experiment is continuous, that is to say, being is undivided (and indivisible): “for you will not sever being from holding to being.” (DK28B4.2) Being is eternal and unchanging; for if being were to change or become in any way, this would entail that in some sense it had participated or would participate in not-being which is impossible: “How could being perish? How could it come to be?/For if it came to be, it was not, nor if it is ever about to come to be./In this way becoming has been extinguished and destruction is not heard of.” (DK28B8.19-21)

Being, for Parmenides, is thus eternal, unchanging, and indivisible spatially or temporally. Heraclitus might have been right to note the way things appear, (as a constant state of becoming) but he was wrong, on Parmenides’ view, to confuse the way things appear with the way things actually are, or with the “steadfast heart of persuasive truth.” (DK28B1.29) Likewise, Parmenides has argued, thought can only genuinely attend to being—what is eternal, unchanging, and indivisible. Whatever it is that Heraclitus has found in the world of impermanence, it is not, Parmenides holds, philosophy. While unenlightened mortals may attend to the transience of everyday life, the path of genuine wisdom lies in the eternal and unchanging. Thus, while Heraclitus had been the first philosopher of difference, Parmenides is the first to assert explicitly that self-identity, and not difference, is the basis of philosophical thought.

c. Plato

It is these two accounts, the Heraclitean and the Parmenidean (with an emphatic privileging of the latter), that Plato attempts to answer and fuse in his theory of forms. Throughout Plato’s Dialogues, he consistently gives credence to the Heraclitean observation that things in the material world are in a constant state of flux. The Parmenidean inspiration in Plato’s philosophy, however, lies in the fact that, like Parmenides, Plato will explicitly assert that genuine knowledge must concern itself only with that which is eternal and unchanging. So, given the transient nature of material things, Plato will hold that knowledge, strictly speaking, does not apply to material things specifically, but rather, to the Forms (eternal and unchanging) of which those material things are instantiations. In Book V of the Republic, Plato (through Socrates) argues that each human capacity has a matter that is proper exclusively to it. For example, the capacity of seeing has as its proper matter waves of light, while the capacity of hearing has as its proper matter waves of sound. In a proclamation that hearkens almost explicitly to Parmenides, knowledge, Socrates argues, concerns itself with being, while ignorance is most properly affiliated with not-being.

From here, the account continues, (with an eye toward Heraclitus). Everything that exists in the world participates both in being and in not-being. For example, every circle both is and is not “circle.” It is a circle to the extent that we recognize its resemblance, but it is not circle (or the absolute embodiment of what it means to be a circle) because we also recognize that no circle as manifested in the world is a perfect circle. Even the most circular circle in the world will possess minor imperfections, however slight, that will make it not a perfect circle. Thus the things in the world participate both in being and in not-being. (This is the nature of becoming). Since being and not-being each has a specific capacity proper to it, becoming, lying between these two, must have a capacity that is proper only to it. This capacity, he argues, is opinion, which, as is fitting, is that epistemological mode or comportment lying somewhere between knowledge and ignorance.

Therefore, when one’s attention is turned only to the things of the world, she can possess only opinions regarding them. Knowledge, reserved only for that domain of being, that which is and cannot not be, for Plato, applies only to the Form of the thing, or what it means to be x and nothing but x. This Form is an eternal and unchanging reality. If one has knowledge of the Form, then one can evaluate each particular in the world, in order to accurately determine whether or not it in fact accords with the principle in question. If not, one may only have opinions about the thing. For example, if one possesses knowledge of the Form of the beautiful, then one may evaluate particular things in the world—paintings, sculptures, bodies, and so forth—and know whether or not they are in fact beautiful. Lacking this knowledge, however, one may hold opinions as to whether or not a given thing is beautiful, but one will never have genuine knowledge of it. More likely, she will merely possess certain tastes on the matter—(I like this poem; I do not like that painting, and so forth.) This is why Socrates, especially in the earlier dialogues, is adamant that his interlocutors not give him examples in order to define or explain their concepts (a pious action is doing what I am doing now...). Examples, he argues, can never tell me what the Form of the thing is, (such as piety, in the Euthyphro). The philosopher, Plato holds, concerns himself with being, or the essentiality of the Form, as opposed to the lover of opinion, who concerns himself only with the fleeting and impermanent.

From this point, however, things in the Platonic account start to get more complicated. “Participation” is itself a somewhat messy notion that Plato never quite explains in any satisfactory way. After all, what does it mean to say, as Socrates argues in the Republic, that the ring finger participates in the form of the large when compared to the pinky, and in the form of the small when compared to the middle finger? It would seem to imply that a thing’s participation in its relevant Form derives, not from anything specific about its nature, but only insofar as its nature is related to the nature of another thing. But the story gets even more complicated in that at multiple points in his later dialogues, Plato argues explicitly for a Form of the different, which complicates what we typically call Platonism, almost beyond the point of recognition, (see, for example, Theaetetus 186a; Parmenides 143b, 146b, and 153a; and Sophist 254e, 257b, and 259a).

On its face, this should not be surprising. If a finger sometimes participates in the form of the large and sometimes in the form of the small, it should stand to reason that any given thing, when looked at side by side with something similar, will be said to participate in the form of the same, while by extension, when compared to something that differs in nature, will be said to participate in the form of the different—and participate more greatly in the form of the different, the more different the two things are. A baseball, side by side with a softball, will participate greatly in the form of the same, (but somewhat in the Form of the different), but when looked at side by side with a cardboard box, will participate more in the Form of the different.

But consistently articulating what a Form of the different would be is more complicated than it may at first seem. To say that the Form of x is what it means to be x and nothing but x is comprehensible enough, when one is dealing with an isolable characteristic or set of characteristics of a thing. If we say, for instance, that the Form of circle is what it means to be a circle and nothing but a circle, we know that we mean all of the essential characteristics that make a circle, a circle, (a round-plane figure the boundary of which consists of points, equidistant from a center; an arc of 360°, and so forth.). By implication, each individual Form, to the extent that it completely is what it is, also participates equally in the Form of the same, in that it is the same as itself, or it is self-identical. But what can it possibly mean to say that the form of the different is what it means to be different and nothing but different? It would seem to imply that the identity of the form of the different is that it differs, but this requires that it differs even from itself. For if the essence of the different is that it is the same as the different, (in the way that the essence of circle is self-identical to what it means to be circle), then this would entail that the essence of the Form of the different is that, to the same extent that it is different, it participates equally in the Form of the same, (or that, like the rest of the Forms, it is self-identical). But the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same; it must bear nothing of the Form of the same. But this means that the Form of the different must be different from the different as well; put otherwise, while for every other conceivable Platonic Form, one can say that it is self-identical, the Form of the different would be absolutely unique in that its nature would be defined by its self-differentiation.

But there are further complications still. Each Form in Plato’s ontology must relate to every other Form by way of the Form of the different. From this it follows that, just as the Form of the same pervades all the other Forms, (in that each is identical to itself), the Form of the different also pervades all the other Forms, (in that each Form is different from every other). This implies, in some sense, that the different is co-constitutive, along with Plato’s Form of the same, of each other individual Form. After all, part of what makes a thing what it is, (and hence, self-same, or self-identical), is that it differs from everything that it is not. To the extent that the Form of the same makes any given Form what it is, it is commensurably different from every other Form that it is not.

This complication, however, reaches its apogee when we consider the Form of the same specifically. As we said, the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same. The Form of the same differs from all other Forms as well. While, for instance, the Form of the beautiful participates in the Form of the same, (in that the beautiful is the same as the beautiful, or it is self-identical), nevertheless, the Form of the same is different from, (that is, it is not the same as) the Form of the beautiful. The Form of the same differs, similarly, from all other Forms. However, its difference from the Form of the different is a special relation. If the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same, we can say reciprocally, that the Form of the same is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the different; it relates to the different through the different. But this means that, to the extent that the Form of the same is self-same, or self-identical, it is so because it differs absolutely from the Form of the different. This entails, however, that its self-sameness derives from its maximal participation in the Form of the different itself.

We see, then, the danger posed by Plato’s Form of the different, and hence, by any attempt to formulate a concept of difference itself. Plato’s Form of the same is ubiquitous throughout his ontology; it is, in a certain sense, the glue that holds together the rest of the Forms, even if in many of his Middle Period dialogues, it never makes an explicit appearance. Simply by understanding what a Form means for Plato, we can see the central role that the Form of the same plays for this, or for that matter, any other essentialist ontology. By simply introducing a Form of the different, and attempting to rigorously think through its implications, one can see that it threatens to fundamentally undermine the Form of the same itself, and hence by implication, difference threatens to devour the whole rest of the ontological edifice of essentialism. Plato, it seems, was playing with Heraclitean fire. It is likely largely for this reason that Aristotle, Plato’s greatest student, nixes the Form of the different in his Metaphysics.

d. Aristotle

In the Metaphysics, Aristotle attempts to correct what he perceives to be many of Plato’s missteps. For our purposes, what is most important is his treatment of the notion of difference. For Aristotle inserts into the discussion a presupposition that Plato had not employed, namely, that ‘difference’ may be said only of things which are, in some higher sense, identical. Where Plato’s Form of the different may be said to relate everything to everything else, Aristotle argues that there is a conceptual distinction to be made between difference and otherness.

For Aristotle, there are various ways in which a thing may be said to be one, in terms of: (1) Continuity; (2) Wholeness or unity; (3) Number; (4) Kind. The first two are a bit tricky to distinguish, even for Aristotle. By continuity, he means the general sense in which a thing may be said to be a thing. A bundle of sticks, bound together with twine, may be said to be one, even if it is a result of human effort that has made it so. Likewise, an individual body part, such as an arm or leg, may be said to be one, as it has an isolable functional continuity. Within this grouping, there are greater and lesser degrees to which something may be said to be one. For instance, while a human leg may be said to be one, the tibia or the femur, on their own, are more continuous, (in that each is numerically one, and the two of them together form the leg).

With respect to wholeness or unity, Aristotle clarifies the meaning of this as not differing in terms of substratum. Each of the parts of a man, (the legs, the arms, the torso, the head), may be said to be, in their own way, continuous, but taken together, and in harmonious functioning, they constitute the oneness or the wholeness of the individual man and his biological and psychological life. In this sense, the man is one, in that all of his parts function naturally together towards common ends. In the same respect, a shoelace, each eyelet, the sole, and the material comprising the shoe itself, may be said to be, each in their own way, continuous, while taken together, they constitute the wholeness of the shoe.

Oneness in number is fairly straightforward. A man is one in the organic sense above, but he is also one numerically, in that his living body constitutes one man, as opposed to many men. Finally, there is generic oneness, the oneness in kind or in intelligibility. There is a sense in which all human beings, taken together, may be said to be one, in that they are all particular tokens of the genus human. Likewise, humans, cats, dogs, lions, horses, pigs, and so forth, may all be said to be one, in that they are all types of the genus animal.

Otherness is the term that Aristotle uses to characterize existent things which are, in any sense of the term, not one. There is, as we said, a sense in which a horse and a woman are one, (in that both are types of the genus animal), but an obvious sense in which they are other as well. There is a sense in which my neighbor and I are one, (in that we are both tokens of the genus human), but insofar as we are materially, emotionally, and psychologically distinct, there is a sense in which I am other than my neighbor as well. There is an obvious sense in which I and my leg are one but there is also a sense in which my leg is other than me as well, (for if I were to lose my leg in an accident, provided I received prompt and proper medical attention, I would continue to exist). Every existent thing, Aristotle argues, is by its very nature either one with or other than every other existent thing.

But this otherness does not, (as it does for Plato’s Form of the different), satisfy the conditions for what Aristotle understands as difference. Since everything that exists is either one with or other than everything else that exists, there need not be any definite sense in which two things are other. Indeed, there may be, (as we saw above, my neighbor and I are one in the sense of tokens of the genus human, but are other numerically), but there need not be. For instance, you are so drastically other than a given place, say, a cornfield, that we need not even enumerate the various ways in which the two of you are other.

This, however, is the key for Aristotle: otherness is not the same as difference. While you are other than a particular cornfield, you are not different than a cornfield. Difference, strictly speaking, applies only when there is some definite sense in which two things may be said to differ, which requires a higher category of identity within which a distinction may be drawn: “For the other and that which it is other than need not be other in some definite respect (for everything that is existent is either other or same), but that which is different is different from some particular thing in some particular respect, so that there must be something identical whereby they differ. And this identical thing is genus or species...” (Metaphysics, X.3) In other words, two human beings may be different, (that is, one may be taller, lighter-skinned, a different gender, and so forth), but this is because they are identical in the sense that both are specific members of the genus ‘human.’ A human being may be different than a cat, (that is, one is quadripedal while the other is bipedal, one is non-rational while the other is rational, and so forth), but this is because they are identical in the sense that both are specified members of the genus ‘animal.’

But between these two, generic and specific, specific difference or contrariety is, according to Aristotle, the greatest, most perfect, or most complete. This assessment too is rooted in Aristotle’s emphasis on identity as the basis of differentiation. Differing in genus in Aristotelian terminology means primarily belonging to different categories of being, (substance, time, quality, quantity, place, relation, and so forth.) You are other than ‘5,’ to be sure, but Aristotle would not say that you are different from ‘5,’ because you are a substance and ‘5’ is a quantity and given that these two are distinct categories of being, for Aristotle there is not really a meaningful sense in which they can be said to relate, and hence, there is not a meaningful sense in which they can be said to differ. Things that differ in genus are so far distant (closer, really, to otherness), as to be nearly incomparable. However, a man may be said to be different than a cat, because the characteristics whereby they are distinguished from each other are contrarieties, occupying opposing sides of a given either/or, for instance, rational v. non-rational. Special difference or contrariety thus provides us with an affirmation or a privation, a ‘yes’ or a ‘no’ that constitutes the greatest difference, according to Aristotle. Differences in genus are too great, while differences within species are too minute and numerous (skin color, for instance, is manifested in an infinite myriad of ways), but special contrariety is complete, embodying an affirmation or negation of a particular given quality whereby genera are differentiated into species.

There are thus two senses in which, for Aristotle, difference is thought only in accordance with a principle of identity. First, there is the identity that two different things share within a common genus. (A rock and a tree are identical in that both are members of the genus, ‘substance,’ differentiated by the contrariety of ‘living/non-living.’) Second, there is the identity of the characteristic whereby two things are differentiated: material (v. non-material), living (v. non-living), sentient (v. non-sentient), rational (v. irrational), and so forth.

We see, then, that with Aristotle, difference becomes fully codified within the tradition as the type of empirical difference that we mentioned at the outset of this article: it is understood as a recognizable relation between two things which, prior to (and independently of) their relating, possess their own self-contained identities. This difference then is a way in which a thing A, (which is identical to itself) is not like a thing B (which is identical to itself), while both belong to a higher category of identity, (in the sense of an Aristotelian genus). Given the difficulties that we encountered with Plato’s attempt to think a Form of the different, it is perhaps little wonder that Aristotle’s understanding of difference was left unchallenged for nearly two and a half millennia.

2. Key Themes of Differential Ontology

As noted in the Introduction, differential ontology is a term that can be applied to two specific thinkers (Deleuze and Derrida) of the late twentieth century, along with those philosophers who have followed in the wakes of these two. It is, nonetheless, not applicable as a school of thought, in that there is not an identifiable doctrine or set of doctrines that define what they think. Indeed, for as many similarities that one can find between them, there are likely equally many distinctions as well. They work out of different philosophical traditions: Derrida primarily from the Hegel-Husserl-Heidegger triumvirate, with Deleuze, (speaking critically of the phenomenological tradition for the most part) focusing on the trinity of Spinoza-Nietzsche-Bergson. Theologically, they are interested in different sources, with Derrida giving constant nods to thinkers in the tradition of negative theology, such as Meister Eckhart, while Deleuze is interested in the tradition of univocity, specifically in John Duns Scotus. They have different attitudes toward the history of metaphysics, with Derrida working out of the Heideggerian platform of the supposed end of metaphysics, while Deleuze explicitly rejects all talk of any supposed end of metaphysics. They hold different attitudes toward their own philosophical projects, with Derrida coining the term, (following Heidegger’s Destruktion), deconstruction, while for Deleuze, philosophy is always a constructivism. In many ways, it is difficult to find two thinkers who are less alike than Deleuze and Derrida. Nevertheless, what makes them both differential ontologists is that they are working within a framework of specific thematic critiques and assumptions, and that on the basis of these factors, both come to argue that difference in itself has never been recognized as a legitimate object of philosophical thought, to hold that identities are always constituted, on the basis of difference in itself, and to explicitly attempt to formulate such a concept. Let us now look to these thematic, structural elements.

a. Immanence

The word immanence is contrasted with the word transcendence. “Transcendence” means going beyond, while “immanence” means remaining within, and these designations refer to the realm of experience. In most monotheistic religious traditions, for instance, which emphasize creation ex nihilo, God is said to be transcendent in the sense that He exists apart from His creation. God is the source of nature, but God is not, Himself, natural, nor is he found within anything in nature except perhaps in the way in which one might see reflections of an artist in her work of art. Likewise God does not, strictly speaking, resemble any created thing. God is eternal, while created beings are temporal; God is without beginning, while created things have a beginning; God is a necessary being, while created things are contingent beings; God is pure spirit, while created things are material. The creature closest in nature to God is the human being who, according to the Biblical book of Genesis, is created in the image of God, but even in this case, God is not to be understood as resembling human beings: “For my thoughts are not your thoughts, neither are my ways your ways...” (Isaiah 55:8).

In this sense, we can say that historically, the trend in Eastern philosophies and religions (which are not as radically differentiated as they are in the Western tradition), has always leaned much more in the direction of immanence than of transcendence, and definitely more so than nearly all strains of Western monotheism. In schools of Eastern philosophy that have some notion of the divine (and a great many of them do not), many if not most understand the divine as somehow embodied or manifested within the world of nature. Such a position would be considered idolatrous in most strains of Western monotheism.

With respect to the Western philosophical tradition specifically, we can say that, even in moments when religious tendencies and doctrines do not loom large, (like they do, for instance, during the Medieval period), there nevertheless remains a dominant model of transcendence throughout, though this transcendence is emphasized in greater and lesser degrees across the history of philosophy. There have been outliers, to be sure—Heraclitus comes to mind, along with Spinoza and perhaps David Hume, but they are rare. A philosophy rooted in transcendence will, in some way, attempt to ground or evaluate life and the world on the basis of principles or criteria not found (indeed not discoverable de jure) among the living or in the world. When Parmenides asserts that the object of philosophical thought must be that which is, and which cannot not be, which is eternal, unchanging, and indivisible, he is describing something beyond the realm of experience. When Plato claims that genuine knowledge is found only in the Form; when he argues in the Phaedo that the philosophical life is a preparation for death; that one must live one’s life turning away from the desires of the body, in the purification of the spirit; when he alludes, (through the mouth of Socrates) to life as a disease, he is basing the value of this world on a principle not found in the world. When St. Paul writes that “...the flesh lusts against the Spirit, and the Spirit against the flesh; and these are contrary to one another, so that you do not do the things you wish” (Galatians 5:17), and that “the mind governed by the flesh is death,” (Romans 8:6), he is evaluating this world against another. When René Descartes recognizes his activity of thinking and finds therein a soul; when John Locke bases Ideas upon a foundation of primary qualities, immanent, allegedly, to the thing, but transcendent to our experience; when Immanuel Kant bases phenomenal appearances upon noumenal realities, which, outside of space, time, and all causality, ever elude cognition; when an ethical thinker seeks a moral law, or an absolute principle of the good against which human behaviors may be evaluated; in each of these cases, a transcendence of some sort is posited—something not found within the world is sought in order to make sense of or provide a justification for this world.

Famously, Friedrich Nietzsche argued that the history of philosophy was one of the true world finally becoming a fable. Tracing the notion of the true world from its sagely Platonic (more accurately, Parmenidean) inception up through and beyond its Kantian (noumenal) manifestation, he demonstrates that as the demand for certainty (the will to Truth) intensifies, the so-called true world becomes less plausible, slipping further and further away, culminating in the moment he called “the death of God.” The true world has now been abolished, leaving only the apparent world. But the world was only ever called apparent by comparison with a purported true world (think here of Parmenides’ castigation of Heraclitus). Thus, when the true world is abolished, the apparent world is abolished as well; and we are left with only the world, nothing more than the world.

One of the key features of differential ontology will be the adoption of Nietzsche’s proclaimed (and reclaimed) enthusiasm for immanence. Deleuze and Derrida will, each in his own way, argue that philosophy must find its basis within and take as its point of departure the notion of immanence. As we shall see below, in Deleuze’s philosophy, this emphasis on immanence will take the form of his enthusiasm for the Scotist doctrine of the univocity of being. For Derrida, it will be his lifelong commitment to the phenomenological tradition, inspired by the vast body of research conducted over nearly half a century by Edmund Husserl, out of which Derrida’s professional research platform began, (and in which he discovers the notion of différance).

b. Time as Differential

Related to the privileging of immanence is the second principle of central importance to differential ontology, a careful and rigorous analysis of time. Such analysis, inspired by Edmund Husserl, will yield the discovery of a differential structure, which stands in opposition to the traditional understanding of time, the spatially organized, puncti-linear model of time. This refers to a conglomeration of various elements from Plato, Aristotle, St. Augustine, Boethius, and ultimately, the Modern period.

Few thinkers have attempted so rigorously as Aristotle to think the paradoxical nature of time. If we take the very basic model of time as past-present-future, Aristotle notes that one part of this (the past), has been but is no more, while another part of it (the future) will be but is not yet. There is an inherent difficulty, therefore, in trying to understand what time is, because it seems as though it is composed of parts made up of things that do not exist; therefore, we are attempting to understand what something that does not exist, is.

Furthermore, the present or the now itself, for Aristotle, is not a part of time, because a part is so called because of its being a constitutive element of a whole. However, time, Aristotle claims, is not made up of nows, in the same way that a line, though it has points, is not made up of points.

Likewise, the now cannot simply remain the same, but nor can it be said to be discrete from other nows and ever-renewed. For if the now is ever the same, then everything that has ever happened is contained within the present now, (which seems absurd); but if each now is discrete, and is constantly displaced by another discrete, self-contained now, the displacement of the old now would have to take place within (or simultaneously with) the new, incoming now, which would be impossible, as discrete nows cannot be simultaneous; hence time as such would never pass.

Aristotle will therefore claim that there is a sense in which the now is constantly the same, and another sense in which it is constantly changing. The now is, Aristotle argues, both a link of and the limit between future and past. It connects future and past, but is at the same time the end of the past and the beginning of the future; but the future and the past lie on opposite sides of the now, so the now cannot, strictly speaking, belong either to the past or to the future. Rather, it divides the past from the future. The essence of the now is this division—as such, the now itself is indivisible, “the indivisible present ‘now’.” (Physics IV.13). Insofar as each now succeeds another in a linear movement from future to past, the now is ever-changing—what is predicated of the now is constantly filled out in an ever-new way. But structurally speaking, inasmuch as the now is always that which divides and unites future and past, it is constantly the same.

Without the now, there would be no time, Aristotle argues, and vice versa. For what we call time is merely the enumeration that takes place in the progression of history between some moment, future or past, relative to the now moment: “For time is just this—number of motion in respect of ‘before’ and ‘after’.” (Physics, IV.11)

Here, then, are the elements that Aristotle leaves us with: an indivisible now moment that serves as the basis of the measure of time, which is a progression of enumeration taking place between moments, and a notion of relative distance that marks that progression of enumeration.

In Plato, St. Augustine, and Boethius, we find an important distinction between time and eternity: (it is important to note that Aristotle’s discussion of time is found in his Physics, not in his Metaphysics, because time, as the measure of change, belongs only to the things of nature, not to the divine). The reason that this is an important distinction for our purposes is that eternity, (for Plato, Augustine, and Boethius), is the perspective of the divine, while temporality is the perspective of creation. Eternity, for all three of these thinkers, does not mean passing through every moment of time in the sense of having always been there, and always being there throughout every moment of the future, (which is called ‘sempiternity’). All three of these philosophers view time as itself a created thing, and eternity, the perspective of the divine, stands outside of time.

Having created the entire spectrum of time, and standing omnisciently outside of time, the divine sees the whole of time, in an ever-present now. This complete fullness of the now is how Plato, St. Augustine, and Boethius understand eternity. Once we have made this move, however, it is a very short leap to the conclusion that, in a sense, all of time is ever-present; certainly not from our perspective, but from the perspective of the divine. In other words, right now, in an ever-present now, God is seeing the exodus of the Israelites, the sacking of Troy, the execution of Socrates, the crucifixion of Jesus, the fall of the Roman Empire, and the moment (billions of years from now) that the sun will become a Red Giant. Therefore, what we call the now is, on this model, no more or less significant, and no more or less NOW, than any other moment in time. It only appears to be so, from our very limited, finite perspectives. From the perspective of eternity, however, each present is equally present. Plato refers to time in the Timaeus as a “moving image of eternity.” (Timaeus, 37d)

The final piece of the puncti-linear model of time comes from the historical moment of the scientific revolution, with the conceptual birth of absolute time. On the Modern view, time is not the Aristotelian measure of change; rather, the measure of change is how we typically perceive time. Time, in and of itself, however, just is, in the same way that space, on the Modern view, just is—it is mathematical, objectively uniform and unitary, and the same in all places, its units (or moments) unfolding with precise regularity. Though the term “absolute time” was officially introduced by Sir Isaac Newton in his Philosophiae Naturalis Principia Mathematica (1687), as that which “from its own nature flows equably without regard to anything external,” it is nevertheless clear that the experiments and theories of both Johannes Kepler and Galileo Galilei (both of whom historically preceded Newton) assume a model of absolute time. None other than René Descartes, the philosopher who did more than any other to usher in the modern sciences, writes in the third of his famous Meditations on First Philosophy, (where he argues for the existence of God) “for the whole time of my life may be divided into an infinity of parts, each of which is in no way dependent on any other...”

The puncti-linear model of time, then, conceives the whole of time as a series of now-points, or moments, each of which makes up something like an atom of time (as the physical atom is a unit of space). Each of those moments is ontologically and logically independent of every other, with the present moment being the now-point most alive. The past, then, is conceived as those presents that have come and gone, while the future is conceived as those presents that have not yet come, and insofar as we speak of past and future moments as occupying points of greater and lesser distances with respect to the present and to each other as well, we are, whether we realize it or not, conceiving of time as a linear progression; thus when we attempt to understand the essence of time, we tend to conceptually spatialize it. This prejudice is most easily seen in the ease with which our mind leaps to timelines in order to conceptualize relations of historical events.

Edmund Husserl, whose 1904-1905 lectures On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time probably did more to shape the future of the continental tradition in philosophy in the twentieth century than any other single text, was also very influential on the issue of time consciousness. There, Husserl constructs a model of time consciousness that he calls “the living present.” Whether or not there is any such thing as real time, or absolute time is, for Husserl, one of those questions that is bracketed in the performance of the phenomenological epochē; time, for Husserl, as everything else, is to be analyzed in terms of its objective qualities, in other words, in terms of how it is lived by a constituting subject. Husserl’s point of departure is to object to the theory of experience offered by Husserl’s mentor, Franz Brentano. Assuming (though not making explicit) the puncti-linear model of time, Brentano distinguishes between two basic types of experience. The primary mode is perception, which is the consciousness of the present now-point. All modes of the past are understood in terms of memory, which is the imagined recollection or representation of a now-moment no longer present. If you are asked to call to mind your celebration of your tenth birthday, you are employing the faculty of memory. And every mode of experience dealing with the past (or the no-longer-present), is understood by Brentano as memory.

This understanding presents a problem, though. From the moment you began reading the first word of this sentence, from, until this moment right now, as you are reading these words, there is a type of memory being employed. Indeed, in order to genuinely experience any given experience as an experience, and not just a random series of moments, there must be some operation of memory taking place. To cognize a song as a song, rather than a random series of notes, we must have some memory of the notes that have come just before, and so on. However, the type of memory that is being used here seems to be qualitatively different than the sort of memory employed when you are encouraged to reflect upon your tenth birthday, or even, to reflect upon what you had for dinner last night. This type of reflection, (or representation) is a calling-back-to-mind of an event that was experienced at some point in the past, but has long since left consciousness, while the other (the sort of memory it takes to cognize a sentence or a paragraph, for instance), is an operative memory of an event that has not yet left consciousness. Both are modes of memory, to be sure, but they are qualitatively different modes of memory, Husserl argues.

Moreover, in each moment of experience, we are at the same time looking forward to the future in some mode of expectation. This, too, is something we experience on a frequent basis. For instance, when walking through a door that we walk through frequently, we might casually tap the handle and lead with our head and shoulders because we expect that the door, unlocked, will open for us as it always does; when sitting at the bus stop, as the bus approaches the curb, we stand, because we expect that it is our bus, and that it is stopping to let us on. Our expectations are not quite as salient as are our primary memories, but they are there. All it takes is a rupture of some sort—the door may be locked, causing us to hit our head; the bus may not be our bus, or the driver may not see us and may continue driving—to realize that the structure of expectation was present in our consciousness.

Time, Husserl argues, is not experienced as a series of discrete, independent moments that arise and instantly die; rather, experience of the present is always thick with past and future. What Aristotle refers to as the now, Husserl calls the ‘primal impression,’ the moment of impact between consciousness and its intentional object, which is ever-renewed, but also ever-passing away; but the primal impression is constantly surrounded by a halo of retention (or primary memory) and protention (primary expectation). This structure, taken altogether, is what Husserl calls, “the living present.”

Derrida and Deleuze will each employ (while subjecting to strident criticism) Husserl’s concept of the living present. If the present is always constituted as a relation of past to future, then the very nature of time is itself relational, that is to say, it cannot be conceived as points on a line or as seconds on a clock. If time is essentially or structurally relational, then everything we think about ‘things’ (insofar as things are constituted in time), and knowledge (insofar as it takes place in time), will be radically transformed as well. To fully think through the implications of Husserl’s discovery entails a fundamental reorientation toward time and along with it, being. Deleuze employs the retentional-protentional structure of time, while discarding the notion of the primal impression. Derrida will stick with the terms of Husserl’s structure, while demonstrating that the present in Husserl is always infected with or contaminated by the non-present, the structure of which Derrida calls différance.

c. Critique of Essentialist Metaphysics

In a sense it is difficult to talk in a synthetic way about what Deleuze and Derrida find wrong with traditional metaphysics, because they each, in the context of their own specific projects, find distinct problems with the history of metaphysics. However, the following is clear: (1) If we can use the term ‘metaphysics’ to characterize the attempt to understand the fundamental nature of things, and; (2) If we can acknowledge that traditionally the effort to do that has been carried out through the lenses of representational thinking in some form or other, then; (3) the critiques that Deleuze and Derrida offer against the history of metaphysical thinking are centered around the point that traditional metaphysics ultimately gets things wrong.

For Deleuze, this will come down to a necessary and fundamental imprecision that accompanies traditional metaphysics. Inasmuch as the task of metaphysics is to think the nature of the thing, and inasmuch as it sets for itself essentialist parameters for doing so, it necessarily filters its own understanding of the thing through conceptual representations, philosophy can never arrive at an adequate concept of the individual. To our heart’s desire, we may compound and multiply the concepts that we use to characterize a thing, but there will always necessarily be some aspect of that thing left untouched by thinking. Let us use a simple example, an inflated ball—we can describe it by as many representational concepts as we like: it is a certain color or a certain pattern, made of a certain material (rubber or plastic, perhaps), a certain size, it has a certain degree of elasticity, is filled with a certain amount of air, and so forth. However many categories or concepts we may apply to this ball, the nature of this ball itself will always elude us. Our conceptual characterization will always reach a terminus; our concepts can only go so far down. The ball is these characterizations, but it is also different from its characterizations as well. For Deleuze, if our ontology cannot reach down to the thing itself, if it is structurally and essentially incapable of comprehending the constitution of the thing, (as any substance metaphysics will be), then it is, for the most part, worthless as an ontology.

Derrida casts his critiques of the history of metaphysics in the Heideggerian language of presence. The history of philosophy, Derrida argues, is the metaphysics of presence, and the Western religious and philosophical tradition operates by categorizing being according to conceptual binaries: (good/evil, form/matter, identity/difference, subject/object, voice/writing, soul/body, mind/body, invisible/visible, life/death, God/Satan, heaven/earth, reason/passion, positive/negative, masculine/feminine, true/apparent, light/dark, innocence/fallenness, purity/contamination, and so forth.) Metaphysics consists of first establishing the binary, but from the moment it is established, it is already clear which of the two terms will be considered the good term and which the pejorative term—the good term is the one that is conceptually analogous to presence in either its spatial or temporal sense. The philosopher’s task, then, is to isolate the presence as the primary term, and to conceptually purge it of its correlative absent term.

A few examples will help elucidate this point: for Parmenides, divine wisdom entails an attempt to think that which is, at every present moment, the same. Heraclitean flux is the way of the masses. This in part shapes Plato’s emphasis on the eternality of the Form—while the material world changes with the passage of each new present, the Form remains the same, (ever-present or eternal); but in addition, the Form is also that which is closest to (a term of presence) the nature of the soul. In Plato the body, (given that it is in constant flux), is the prison of the soul, and in the Phaedo, life is declared a disease, for which death is the cure. In Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, the most complete happiness for the human being lies in the life of contemplation, because the capacity for contemplation is that which makes us most like the gods, (who are ever the same). So we would be happiest if we could contemplate all the time; however, we unfortunately cannot (as we also have bodies and so, various familial, social, and political responsibilities). In Christianity, the flesh is subject to change (which is the very essence of corruptibility) while the Spirit is incorruptible (or ever-present); for Descartes, (and for the early phenomenological tradition), only what is spatially present (that is, immediate to consciousness), is indubitable. Whether or not the object of my present perception exists in the so-called real world, it is nevertheless indubitable that I am experiencing what I am experiencing, in the moment at which I am experiencing it—Descartes even goes so far as to define clarity (one of his conditions for ‘truth’) as that which is present. And for Descartes, the body (insofar as it is at least possible to doubt its existence), is not most essentially me; rather, my soul is what I am. We saw Aristotle’s emphasis on the now, or the present, as the yardstick against which time is measured. The spatial and temporal senses of the emphasis on presence are completely solidified in the phenomenology of Edmund Husserl, whose phenomenological reduction attempts to focus its attention exclusively on the phenomena of consciousness, because only then can it accord with the philosophical demand for apodicticity; and he understands this experience as constituted on the model of the living present. In each of these cases, a presence is valorized, and its correlative absence is suppressed.

As was the case with Deleuze, however, Derrida will argue that the self-proclaimed task of metaphysics ultimately fails. Thus, (and against some of his more dismissive critics), Derrida operates in the name of truth—when the history of metaphysics posits that presence is primary, and absence secondary, this claim, Derrida shows, is false. Metaphysics, in all of its manifestations, attempts to cast out the impure, but somehow, the impure always returns, in the form of a supplementary term; the secondary term is always ultimately required in order to supplement the primary term. Derrida’s project then is dedicated to demonstrating that if the subordinate term is required in order to supplement the so-called primary term, it can only be because the primary term suffers always and originally from a lack or a deficiency of some sort. In other words, the absence that philosophy sought to cast out was present and infecting the present term from the origin.

3. Key Differential Ontologists

a. Jacques Derrida as a Differential Ontologist

It is in the phenomenology of Edmund Husserl, as we said above, that Derrida discovers the constitutive play known as différance. In its effort to isolate ideal essences, constituted within the sphere of consciousness, phenomenology brackets or suspends all questions having to do with the real existence of the external world, the belief in which Husserl refers to as the natural attitude. The natural attitude is the non-thematic subjective attitude that takes for granted the real existence of the real world, absent and apart from my (or any) experience of it. Science or philosophy, in the mode of the natural attitude, ontologically distinguishes being from our perceptions of being, from which point it becomes impossible to ever again bridge the gap between the two. Try as it might, philosophy in the natural attitude can only ever have representations of being, and certainty (the telos of philosophical activity) becomes untenable. With this in mind, we get Husserl’s famous principle of all principles: “that everything originarily… offered to us in ‘intuition’ is to be accepted simply as what it is presented as being, but also only within the limits in which it is presented there.” (Ideas I, §24) Husserl thus proposes a change in attitude, in what he calls the phenomenological epochē, which suspends all questions regarding the external existence of the objects of consciousness, along with the constituting priority of the empirical self. Both self and world are bracketed, revealing the correlative structure of the world itself in relation to consciousness thereof, opening a sphere of pure immanence, or, in Derrida’s terminology, pure presence. It is for this reason that Husserl represents for Derrida the most strident defense of the metaphysics of presence, and it is for this reason that his philosophy also serves as the ground out of which the notion of constitutive difference is discovered.

In his landmark 1967 text, Voice and Phenomenon, Derrida takes on Husserl’s notion of the sign. The sign, we should note, is typically understood as a stand-in for something that is currently absent. Linguistically a sign is a means by which a speaker conveys to a listener the meaning that currently resides within the inner experience of the speaker. The contents of one person’s experience cannot be transferred or related to the experience of a listener except through the usage of signs, (which we call ‘language’). Knowing this, and knowing that Husserl’s philosophy is an attempt to isolate a pure moment of presence, it is little wonder that he wants, inasmuch as it is possible, to do away with the usage of signs, and isolate an interior moment of presence. It is precisely this aim that Derrida takes apart.

In the opening chapter of Husserl’s First Logical Investigation, titled “Essential Distinctions,” Husserl draws a distinction between different types or functions of signs: expressions and indications. He claims signs are always pointing to something, but what they point to can assume different forms. An indication signifies without pointing to a sense or a meaning. The flu or bodily infection, for instance, is not the meaning of the fever, but it is brought to our attention by way of the fever—the fever, that is, points to an ailment in the body. An expression, however, is a sign that is, itself, charged with conceptual meaning; it is a linguistic sign. There are countless types of signs—animal tracks in the snow point to the recent presence of life, a certain aroma in the house may indicate that a certain food or even a certain ethnicity of food, is being prepared—but expressions are signs that are themselves meaningful.

This distinction (indication/expression) is itself problematic, however, and does not seem to be fundamentally sustainable. An indication may very well be an expression, and expressions are almost always indications. If one’s significant other leaves one a note on the table, for instance, before one has even read the words on the paper, the sheer presence of writing, left in a certain way, on a sheet of paper, situated a certain way on the table, indicates: (1) That the beloved is no longer in the house, and; (2) That the beloved has left one a message to be read. These signs are both indications and expressions. Furthermore, every time we use an expression of some sort, we are indicating something, namely, we are pointing toward an ideal meaning, empirical states of affairs, and so forth. In effect, one would be hard pressed to find a single example of a use of an expression that was not, in some sense, indicative.

Husserl, however, will argue that even if, in fact, expressions are always caught up in an indicative function, that this has nothing to do with the essential distinction, obtaining de jure (if not de facto) between indications and expressions. Husserl cannot relinquish this conviction because, after all, he is attempting to isolate a pure moment of self-presence of meaning. So if expressions are signs charged with meaning, then Husserl will be compelled to locate a pure form of expression, which will require the absolute separation of the expression from its indicative function. Indeed he thinks that this is possible. The reason expressions are almost always indicative is that we use them to communicate with others, and in the going-forth of the sign into the world, some measure of the meaning is always lost—no matter how many signs we use to articulate our experience, the experience can never be perfectly and wholly recreated within the mind of the listener. So to isolate the expressive essence of the expression, we must suspend the going-forth of the sign into the world. This is accomplished in the soliloquy of the inner life of consciousness.

In one’s interior monologue, there is nothing empirical, (nothing from the world), and hence, nothing indicative. The signs themselves have only ideal, not real, existence. Likewise, the signs employed in the interior monologue are not indicative in the way that signs in everyday communication are. Communicative expressions point us to states of affairs or the internal experiences of another person; in short, they point us to empirical events. Expressions of the interior monologue, however, do not point us to empirical realities, but rather, Husserl claims that in the interior expression, the sign points away from itself, and toward its ideal sense. For Husserl, therefore, the purest, most meaningful mode of expression is one in which nothing is, strictly speaking, expressed to anyone.

One might nevertheless wonder, is it not the case, that when one ‘converses’ internally with oneself, that one is, in some sense, articulating meaning to oneself? Here is a mundane example, one which has happened to each of us at some point in time: we walk into a room, and forget why we have entered the room. “Why did I come in here?” we might silently utter to ourselves, and after a moment, we might say to ourselves, “Ah, yes, I came in here to turn down the thermostat,” or something of the like. Is it not the case that the individual is communicating something to herself in this monologue?

Husserl responds in the negative. The signs we are using are not making known to the self a content that was previously inaccessible to the self, (which is what takes place in communication). In pointing away from itself and directly toward the sense, the sense is not conveyed from a self to a self, but rather, the sense of the expression is experienced by the subject at exactly that same moment in time.

This is where Derrida brings into the discussion Husserl’s notion of the living present, for this emphasis on the exact same moment in time relies upon Husserl’s notion of the primal impression. Derrida writes, “The sharp point of the instant, the identity of lived-experience present to itself in the same instant bears therefore the whole weight of this demonstration.” (Voice and Phenomenon, 51). In our discussion above of Husserl’s living present, we saw that the primal impression is constantly displaced by a new primal impression—it is in constant motion. Nevertheless, this does not keep Husserl from referring to the primal impression in terms of a point; it is, he says, the source-point on the basis of which retention is established. While the primal impression is always, as we saw with Husserl, surrounded by a halo of retention and protention, nevertheless this halo is always thought from the absolute center of the primal impression, as the source-point of experience. It is the “non-displaceable center, an eye or living nucleus” of temporality. (Voice and Phenomenon, 53)

This, we note, is the Husserlian manifestation of the emphasis on the temporal sense of presence in the philosophical tradition. Here, we should also note: Derrida never attempts to argue that philosophy should move away from the emphasis on presence. The philosophical tradition is defined by, Derrida claims, its emphasis on the present; the present provides the very foundation of certainty throughout the history of philosophy; it is certainty, in a sense. The present comprises an ineliminable essential element of the whole endeavor of philosophy. So to call it into question is not to try to bring a radical transformation to philosophy, but to shift one’s vantage point to one that inhabits the space between philosophy and non-philosophy. Indeed, Derrida motions in this direction, which is one of the reasons that Derrida is more comfortable than many traditional academic philosophers writing in the style of and in communication with literary figures. The emphasis on presence within philosophy, strictly speaking is incontestable.

Husserl, we saw, formulated his notion of the living present on the basis of his insistence on a qualitative distinction between retention as a mode of memory still connected to the present moment of consciousness, and representational memory, that deliberately calls to mind a moment of the past that has, since its occurrence, left consciousness. This means, for Husserl, that retention must be understood in the mode of Presentation, as opposed to Representation. Retention is a direct intuition of what has just passed, directly presented, and fully seen, in the moment of the now, as opposed to represented memory, which is not. Retention is not, strictly speaking, the present; the primal impression is the present. Nevertheless, retention is still attached to the moment of the now. Furthermore, there is a sense in which retention is necessary to give us the experience of the present as such. The primal impression, where the point of contact occurs, is in a constant mode of passing away, and the impression only becomes recognizable in the mode of retention—as we said, to truly experience a song as a song entails that one must keep in one’s memory the preceding few notes; but this is just another way of saying that the present is constituted in part on the basis of memory, even if memory of what has just passed.

Derrida diagnoses, then, a tension operating at the heart of Husserl’s thinking. On the one hand, Husserl’s phenomenology requires the sharp point of the instant in order to have a pure moment of self-presence, wherein meaning, without the intermediary of signs, can be found. In this sense, retention, though primary memory, is memory nonetheless, and does not give us the present, but is rather, Husserl claims, the “antithesis of perception.” (On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time, 41) Nevertheless, the present as such is only ever constituted on the basis of its becoming concretized and solidified in the acts that constitute the stretching out of time, in retention. Moreover, given that retention is still essentially connected to the primal impression, (which is itself always in the mode of passing away) there is not a radical distinction between retention and primal impression; rather, they are continuous, and the primal impression is really only, Husserl claims, an ideal limit. There is thus a continual accommodation of Husserlian presence to non-presence, which entails the admission of a form of otherness into the self-present now-point of experience. This accommodation is what keeps fundamentally distinct memory as retention and memory as representation.

Nevertheless, the common root, making possible both retention and representational memory, is the structural possibility of repetition itself, which Derrida calls the trace. The trace is the mark of otherness, or the necessary relation of interiority to exteriority. Husserl’s living present is marked by the structure of the trace, Derrida argues, because the primal impression for Husserl, never occurs without a structural retention attached to it. Thus, in the very moment, the selfsame point of time, when the primal impression is impressed within experience, what is essentially necessary to the structure, (in other words, not an accidental feature thereof), is the repeatability of the primal impression within retention. To be experienced in a primal impression therefore requires that the object of experience be repeatable, such that it can mark itself within the mode of retention, and ultimately, representational memory. Thus the primal impression is traced with exteriority, or non-presence, before it is ever empirically stamped.

On the basis of this trace that constitutes the presence of the primal impression, Derrida introduces the concept of différance:

[T]he trace in the most universal sense, is a possibility that must not only inhabit the pure actuality of the now, but must also constitute it by means of the very movement of the différance that the possibility inserts into the pure actuality of the now. Such a trace is, if we are able to hold onto this language without contradicting it and erasing it immediately, more ‘originary’ than the phenomenological originarity itself... In all of these directions, the presence of the present is thought beginning from the fold of the return, beginning from the movement of repetition and not the reverse. Does not the fact that this fold in presence or in self-presence is irreducible, that this trace or this différance is always older than presence and obtains for it its openness, forbid us from speaking of a simple self-identity ‘im selben Augenblick’? (Voice and Phenomenon, 58)

Différance, Derrida says, is a movement, a differentiating movement, on the basis of which the presence (the ground of philosophical certainty) is opened up. The self-presence of subjectivity, in which certainty is established, is inseparable from an experience of time, and the structural essentialities of the experience of time are marked by the trace. It is more originary than the primordiality of phenomenological experience, because it is what makes it possible in the first place. From this it follows, Derrida claims, that Husserl’s project of locating a moment of pure presence will be necessarily thwarted, because in attempting to rigorously think it through, we have found hiding behind it this strange structure signifying a movement and hence, not a this, that Derrida calls différance.

Using Derrida’s terminology, (which we shall presently dissect), we can say that différance is the non-originary, constituting-disruption of presence. Let us take this bit by bit. Différance is constituting—this signifies, as we saw in Husserl, that it is on the basis of this movement that presence is constituted. Derrida claims that it is the play of différance that makes possible all modes of presence, including the binary categories and concepts in accordance with which philosophy, since Plato, has conducted itself. That it is constitutive does not, however, mean that it is originary, at least not without qualification. To speak of origins, for Derrida, implies an engagement with a presumed moment of innocence or purity, in other words, a moment of presence, from which our efforts at meaning have somehow fallen away. Derrida says, rather, that différance is a “non-origin which is originary.” (“Freud and the Scene of Writing,” Writing and Difference, 203) Différance is, in a sense, an origin, but one that is already, at the origin, contaminated; hence it is a non-originary origin.

At the same time, because différance as play and movement always underlie the constitutive functioning of philosophical concepts, it likewise always attenuates this functioning, even as it constitutes it. Différance prevents the philosophical concepts from ever carrying out fully the operations that their author intends them to carry out. This constituting-disruption is the source of one of Derrida’s more (in)famous descriptions of the deconstructive project: “But this condition of possibility turns into a condition of impossibility.” (Of Grammatology, 74)

Différance attenuates both senses of presence to which we referred above: (1) Spatially, it differs, creating spaces, ruptures, chasms, and differences, rather than the desired telos of absolute proximity; (2) Temporally, it defers, delaying presence from ever being fully attained. Thus it is that Derrida, capitalizing on the “two motifs of the Latin differre...” will understand différance in the dual sense of differing and deferring (“Différance,” in Margins of Philosophy, 8)

Derrida is therefore a differential ontologist in that, through his critiques of the metaphysical tradition, he attempts to think the fundamental explicitly on the basis of a differential structure, reading the canonical texts of the philosophical tradition both with and against the intentions of their authors. In so doing, he attempts to expose the play of force underlying the constitution of meaning, and thereby, to open new trajectories of thinking, rethinking the very concept of the concept, and forging a path “toward the unnameable.” (Voice and Phenomenon, 66)

b. Gilles Deleuze as a Differential Ontologist

As early as 1954, in one of Deleuze’s first publications, (a review of Jean Hyppolite’s book, Logic and Existence), Deleuze stresses the urgency for an ontology of pure difference, one that does not rely upon the notion of negation, because negation is merely difference, pushed to its outermost limit. An ontology of pure difference means an attempt to think difference as pure relation, rather than as a not-.

The reason for this urgency, as we saw above, is that the task of philosophy is to have a direct relation to things, and in order for this to happen, philosophy needs to grasp the thing itself, and this means, the thing as it differs from everything else that it is not, the thing as it essentially is. Reason, he claims, must reach down to the level of the individual. In other words, philosophy must attempt to think what he calls internal difference, or difference internal to Being itself. Above we noted that however many representational concepts we may adduce in order to characterize a thing, (our example above was a ball), so long as we are using concepts rooted in identity to grasp it, we will still be unable to think down to the level of what makes this, this. Therefore, philosophy suffers from an essential imprecision, which only differential ontology can repair.

This imprecision is rooted, Deleuze argues, in the Aristotelian moment, specifically in Aristotle’s metaphysics of analogy. Aristotle’s notion of metaphysics as first philosophy is that, while other sciences concentrate on one or another domain of being, metaphysics is to be the science of being qua being. Unlike every other science, (which all study some genus or species of being), the object of the metaphysical science, being qua being, is not a genus. This is because any given genus is differentiated (by way of differences) into species. Any species, beneath its given genus, is fully a member of that genus, but the difference that has so distinguished it, is not. Let us take an example: the genus animal. In this case, the difference, we might say, is rational, by which the genus animal is speciated into the species of man and beast, for Aristotle. Both man and beast are equally members of the genus animal, but rational, the differentia whereby they are separated, is not. Differentiae cannot belong, properly, to the given genus of which they are differentiae, and yet, differences exist, that is, they have being. Therefore, if differences have being, and the differentiae of any given genus cannot belong, properly speaking, to that genus, it follows that being cannot be a genus.

Metaphysics therefore cannot be the science of being as such, (because, given that there is no genus, ‘being,’ there is no being as such), but rather, of being qua being, or, put otherwise, the science that focuses on beings insofar as they are said to be. The metaphysician, Aristotle holds, must study being by way of abstraction—all that is is said to be in virtue of something common, and this commonality, Aristotle holds, is rooted in a thing’s being a substance, or a bearer of properties. The primary and common way in which a thing is said to be, Aristotle argues, is that it is a substance, a bearer of properties. Properties are, no doubt, but they are only to the extent that there is a substance there to bear them. There is no ‘red’ as such; there are only red things. Metaphysics, therefore, is the science that studies primarily the nature of what it means to be a substance, and what it means to be an attribute of a substance, but insofar as it relates to a substance. All of these other qualities, and along with them, the Aristotelian categories, are related analogically, through substances, to being. This explains Aristotle’s famous dictum: Being is said in many ways. (Metaphysics, IV.2) This is Aristotle’s doctrine known as the equivocity of being. Being is hierarchical in that there are greater and lesser degrees to which a thing may be said to be. In this sense, analogical being is a natural bedfellow with the theological impetus, in that it provides a means of speaking and thinking about God that does not flirt with heresy, that falls into neither of the two following traps: (1) Believing that a finite mind could ever possess knowledge of an infinite being; (2) Thinking that God’s qualities, for instance, his love or his mercy, are to be understood in like fashion to our own. Analogical being easily and naturally allows the Scholastic tradition to hierarchize the scala naturae, the great chain of being, thus creating a space in language and in thought for the ineffable.

Deleuze, however, will argue that the Aristotelian equivocity disallows ontology a genuine concept of Being, of the individual, or of difference itself: “However, this form of distribution commanded by the categories seemed to us to betray the nature of Being (as a cardinal and collective concept) and the nature of the distributions themselves (as nomadic rather than sedentary and fixed distributions), as well as the nature of difference (as individuating difference).” (Difference and Repetition, 269) By ‘cardinal’ and ‘collective,’ respectively, Deleuze means Being as the fundamental nature of what-is, (which is the individuating power of differentiation) and being as the whole of what-is. Analogical being, Deleuze objects, cannot think being as such (because being is not a genus, for Aristotle), and then, because it posits substances and categories (fixed, rather than fluid, models of distribution of being), it misses the nature of difference itself (because difference is always ‘filtered’ through a higher concept of identity), as well as the ability to think the individual (because thought can only go as far ‘down’ as the substance, which is always comprehended through our concepts). Thus, ontology, understood analogically, cannot do what it is designed to do: to think being.

To think a genuine concept of difference (and hence, being) requires an ontology which abandons the analogical model of being and affirms the univocity of being, that being is said in only one sense of everything of which it is said. Here, Deleuze cites three key figures that have made such a transformation in thinking possible: John Duns Scotus, Benedict de Spinoza, and Friedrich Nietzsche.

Deleuze calls Duns Scotus’ book, the Opus Oxoniense, “the greatest book of pure ontology.” (Difference and Repetition, 39) Scotus argues against Thomas Aquinas, and hence, against the Aristotelian doctrine of equivocity, in an effort to salvage the reliability of proofs for God’s existence, rooted, as they must be, in the experiences and the minds of human beings. Any argument that draws a conclusion about the being of God on the basis of some fact about his creatures presupposes, Scotus thinks, the univocal expression of the term, ‘being.’ If the being of God is wholly other, or even, analogous to, the being of man, then the relation of the given premises to the conclusion, “God exists,” thereby loses all validity. While, as noted, understanding being analogically affords the theological tradition a handy way of keeping the creation distinct from its creator, this same distance, Scotus thinks, also keeps us from truly possessing natural knowledge about God. So in order to save that knowledge, Scotus had to abolish the analogical understanding of being. However, Deleuze notes, in order to keep from falling into a heresy of another sort (namely, pantheism, the conviction that everything is God), Scotus had to neutralize univocal being. The abstract concept of being precedes the division into the categories of “finite” and “infinite,” so that, even if being is univocal, God’s being is nevertheless distinguished from man’s by way of God’s infinity. Being is therefore, univocal, but neutral and abstract, not affirmed.

Spinoza offers the next step in the affirmation of univocal being. Spinoza creates an elaborate ontology of expression and immanent causality, consisting of substance, attributes, and modes. There is but one substance, God or Nature, which is eternal, self-caused, necessary, and absolutely infinite. A given attribute is conceived through itself and is understood as constituting the essence of a substance, while a mode is an affection of a substance, a way a substance is. God is absolutely free because there is nothing outside of Nature which could determine God to act in such and such a way, so God expresses himself in his creation from the necessity of his own Nature. God’s nature is his power, and his power is his virtue. It is sometimes said that Spinoza’s God is not the theist’s God, and this is no doubt true, but it is equally true that Spinoza’s Nature is not the naturalist’s nature, because Spinoza equates Nature and God; in other words, he makes the world of Nature an object of worshipful admiration, or affirmation. Thus Spinoza takes the step that Scotus could not; nevertheless, Spinoza does not quite complete the transformation to the univocity of being. Spinoza leaves intact the priority of the substance over its modes. Modes can be thought only through substance, but the converse is not true. Thus for the great step Spinoza takes towards the immanentizing of philosophy, he leaves a tiny bit of transcendence untouched. Deleuze writes, “substance must itself be said of the modes and only of the modes.” (Difference and Repetition, 40)

This shift is made, Deleuze claims, with Nietzsche’s notion of eternal return. Deleuze understands Nietzsche’s eternal return in the terms of what Deleuze calls the disjunctive synthesis. In the disjunctive synthesis, we find the in itself of Deleuze’s notion of difference in itself. The eternal return, or the constant returning of the same as the different, constitutes systems, but these systems are, as we saw above, nomadic and fluid, constituted on the basis of disjunctive syntheses, which is itself a differential communication between two or more divergent series.

Given in experience, Deleuze claims, is diversity—not difference as such, but differences, different things, limits, oppositions, and so forth. But this experience of diversity presupposes, Deleuze claims, “a swarm of differences, a pluralism of free, wild, untamed differences; a properly differential and original space and time.” (Difference and Repetition, 50) In other words, the perceived, planar effects of limitations and oppositions presuppose a pure depth or a sub-phenomenal play of constitutive difference. Insofar as they are the conditions of space and time as we sense them, this depth that he is looking for is itself an imperceptible spatio-temporality. This depth (or ‘pure spatium’), he claims, is where difference, singularities, series, and systems, relate and interact. It is necessary, Deleuze claims, because the developmental and differential processes whereby living systems are constituted take place so rapidly and violently that they would tear apart a fully-formed being. Deleuze, comparing the world to an egg, argues that there are “systematic vital movements, torsions and drifts, that only the embryo can sustain: an adult would be torn apart by them.” (Difference and Repetition, 118)

At the embryonic level are series, with each series being defined by the differences between its terms, rather than its terms themselves. Rather, we should say that its terms are themselves differences, or what Deleuze calls intensities: “Intensities are implicated multiplicities, ‘implexes,’ made up of relations between asymmetrical elements.” (Difference and Repetition, 244). An intensity is essentially an energy, but an energy is always a difference or an imbalance, folded in on itself, an essentially elemental asymmetry. These intensities are the terms of a given series. The terms, however, are themselves related to other terms, and through these relations, these intensities are continuously modified. An intensity is an embryonic quantity in that its own internal resonance, which is constitutive of higher levels of synthesis and actualization, pulsates in a pure speed and time that would devastate a constituted being; it is for this reason that qualities and surface phenomena can only come to be on a plane in which difference as such is cancelled or aborted. In explicating its implicated differences, the system, so constituted, cancels out those differences, even if the differential ground rumbles beneath.

A system is formed whenever two or more of these heterogeneous series communicate. Insofar as each series is itself constituted by differences, the communication that takes place between the two heterogeneous series is a difference relating differences, a second-order difference, which Deleuze calls the differenciator, in that these differences relate, and in so relating, they differenciate first-order differences. This relation takes place through what Deleuze calls the dark precursor, comparing it to the negative path cleared for a bolt of lightning. Once this communication is established, the system explodes: “coupling between heterogeneous systems, from which is derived an internal resonance within the system, and from which in turn is derived a forced movement the amplitude of which exceeds that of the basic series themselves.” (Difference and Repetition, 117) The constitution of a series thus results in what we referred to above as the explication of qualities, which are themselves the results of a cancelled difference. Thus, Deleuze claims, the compounding or synthesis of these systems, series, and relations are the introduction of spatio-temporal dynamisms, which are themselves the sources of qualities and extensions.

The whole of being, ultimately, is a system, connected by way of these differential relations—difference relating to difference through difference—the very nature of Deleuze’s disjunctive synthesis. Difference in itself teems with vitality and life. As systems differentiate, their differences ramify throughout the system, and in so doing, series form new series, and new systems, de-enlisting and redistributing the singular points of interest and their constitutive and corresponding nomadic relations, which are themselves implicating, and, conversely, explicated in the phenomenal realm. The disjunctive synthesis is the affirmative employment of the creativity brought about by the various plays of differences. Against Leibniz’s notion of compossibility is opposed the affirmation of incompossibility. Leibniz defined the perfection of the cosmos in terms of its compossibility, and this in terms of a maximization of continuity. The disjunctive synthesis brings about the communication and cooperative disharmony of divergent and heterogeneous series; it does not, thereby, cancel the differences between them. Where incompossibility for Leibniz was a means of exclusion—an infinity of possible worlds excluded from reality on the basis of their incompossibility, in the hands of Deleuze, it becomes a means of opening the thing to the possible infinity of events. It is in this sense that Nietzsche’s eternal return is, for Deleuze, the affirmation of the return of the different, and hence, the affirmation, all of chance, all at once.

Finally, the eternal return is the name that Deleuze gives to the pulsating-contracting temporality according to which the pure spatium or depth differenciates. In Chapter 2 of Difference and Repetition, Deleuze employs the Husserlian discussion of the living present. However, unlike Derrida, Deleuze will simply discard Husserl’s notion of the primal impression—this term never makes an appearance in Difference and Repetition. Deleuze will argue that, with respect to time, the present is all there is, but the present itself is nothing more than the relation of retention to protention. If the present were truly present, (in the sense of a self-contained kernel of time, like Husserl’s primal impression), then, just as Aristotle noted, the present could never pass, because in order to pass, it would have to pass within another moment. The present can only pass, Deleuze claims, because the past is already in the present, reaching through the present, into the future, drawing the future into itself. Time, in other words, is nothing more than the contraction of past and future. The present, therefore, is the beating heart of difference in itself, but it is a present constituted on the basis of a differentiation.

Deleuze is therefore a differential ontologist in that he attempts to formulate a notion of difference that is: (1) The constitutive play of forces underlying the constitution of identities; (2) Purely relational, that is, non-negational, and hence, not in any way subordinate to the principle of identity. It is an ontology that attempts to think the conditions of identity but in such a way as to not recreate the presuppositions surrounding identity at the level of the conditions themselves—it is an ontology that attempts to think the conditions of real experience, the world as it is lived.

4. Conclusion

To briefly sum up, we can say that Derrida and Deleuze are the two key differential ontologists in the history of philosophy. While others before them were indeed thinkers of multiplicity, as opposed to thinkers of identity, none, so rigorously as Derrida and Deleuze, came to the conclusion that what was required in order to truly think multiplicity was an explicit formulation of a concept of difference, in itself. One of the key distinctions between the two of them, which explains many of their other differences, is their respective attitudes towards fidelity to the tradition of philosophy. While Derrida will understand fidelity to the tradition in the sense of embracing the presuppositions and prejudices of the tradition, using them, ultimately, to think beyond the tradition, but in such a way as to speak constantly of the end of metaphysics, and ultimately eschewing the adoption of any traditional philosophical terms such as ontology, being, and so forth; Deleuze, on the contrary, will understand fidelity to the philosophical tradition in the sense of embracing what philosophy has always sought to do, to think the fundamental, and will, in the name of this task, happily discard any presuppositions or prejudices that the tradition has attempted to bestow. So, while Derrida will, for instance, claim that the founding privilege of presence is not up for grabs in philosophy, but will, at the same time, avoid using terms like experience, being, ontology, concept, and so forth, Deleuze will claim that it is precisely the emphasis on presence (in the form of representational concepts and categories) that has kept philosophy from living up to its task. Therefore, the prejudice should be discarded. But that does not mean, Deleuze will argue, that we should give up metaphysics. If the old metaphysics no longer works, throw it out, and build a new one, from the ground up, if need be, but a new metaphysics, all the same.

5. References and Further Reading

The following is an annotated list of the key sources in which the differential ontologies of Derrida and Deleuze are formulated.

a. Primary Sources

  • Deleuze, Gilles. Bergsonism. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam. New York: Zone Books, 1988.
    • Henri Bergson was a French “celebrity” philosopher in the early twentieth century, whose philosophy had very much fallen out of favor in France by the mid to late 1920s, as Husserlian phenomenology began to work its way into Paris. Deleuze’s 1966 text on Bergson played no small part in bringing Bergson back into fashion. In this text, Deleuze analyzes the Bergsonian notions of durée, memory, and élan vital, demonstrating the consistent trajectory of Bergson’s work from beginning to end, and highlighting the centrality of Bergson’s notion of time for the entirety of Deleuze’s thought.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Desert Islands and Other Texts (1953-1974). Ed. David Lapoujade, Trans. Michael Taormina. Los Angeles and New York: Semiotext(e), 2004.
    • This text contains many of Deleuze’s most important essays from his philosophically “formative” years. It contains his 1954 review of Jean Hyppolite’s Logic and Existence, as well as very early essays on Bergson. In addition, it contains interviews and round-table discussions surrounding the period leading up to and following the 1968 release of Difference and Repetition.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Difference and Repetition. Translated by Paul Patton. New York: Columbia University Press, 1994.
    • This is without question the most important book Deleuze ever wrote. It was his principal thesis for the Doctorat D’Etat in 1968, and it is in this text that the various elements that had emerged from his book-length engagements with other philosophers over the years come together into the critique of representation and the formulation of a differential ontology.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Expressionism in Philosophy: Spinoza. Translated by Martin Joughin. New York: Zone Books, 1992.
    • This book was his secondary, historical thesis in 1968, though there is good evidence that the book was actually first drafted in 1961-62, around the same time as the book on Nietzsche. The concept of expression, here analyzed in Spinoza, plays a very important role for Deleuze, and it is Spinoza who provides an alternative ontology of immanence which, contrary to that of Hegel, (quite prominent in mid-1960s France), does not rely upon the movement of negation, a concept that, for Deleuze, does not belong in the domain of ontology. As we saw in the article, Being is itself creative, and hence an object of affirmation, and to make negation an integral element in one’s ontology is, for Deleuze, antithetical to affirmation. Deleuze emphasizes expression, rather than negation. This emphasis already plays a role in the 1954 Review of Hyppolite (mentioned above).
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Kant’s Critical Philosophy. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984.
    • In this 1963 text, Deleuze looks at the philosophy of Immanuel Kant, through the lens of the third CritiqueThe Critique of Judgment, arguing that Kant, (thanks in large part to Salomon Maimon) recognized the problems in the first two Critiques, and began attempting to correct them at the end of his life. In this text Deleuze examines Kant’s notion of the faculties, highlighting that by the time of the third Critique, (and unlike its two predecessors), the faculties are in a discordant accord—none legislating over the others.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. The Logic of Sense. Translated by Mark Lester with Charles Stivale. Edited by Constantin V. Boundas. New York: ColumbiaUniversity Press, 1990.
    • This text is interesting for a number of reasons. First, published in 1969, just one year following Difference and Repetition, it explores many of the same themes of Difference and Repetition, such as becomingtimeeternal returnsingularities, and so forth. At the same time, other themes, such as the event become centrally important, and these themes are now explored through the notion of sense. In a way it is in part a reorientation of Difference and Repetition. But one of the most important points to note is that the notion of the fractal subject is brought into conversation with psychoanalytic theory, and thus, this text forms a bridge between Deleuze’s earlier philosophical works and his political works with Félix Guattari, the first of which, Anti-Oedipus, was released just three years later, in 1972. In addition, the appendices in this volume include important essays on the reversal of Platonism, on the Stoics, and on Pierre Klossowski.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Nietzsche and Philosophy. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson. New York: ColumbiaUniversity Press, 1983.
    • This book, from 1962, was Deleuze’s second book. It may be a stretch to say that this book is the second most important book in Deleuze’s corpus. Nevertheless, it is certainly high on the list of importance. Here we see in their formational expressions, some of the motifs that will dominate all of Deleuze’s works up through The Logic of Sense. Among them are the rejection of negation, the articulation of the eternal return, the incompleteness of the Kantian critique, the purely relational ontology of force, which is the will to power, and so forth. This book lays out in very raw and accessible, (if somewhat underdeveloped) form some of the most significant criticisms later developed in Difference and Repetition.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Dissemination. Translated by Barbara Johnson. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1981.
    • This text was published in 1972, (along with Positions and Margins of Philosophy) as part of Derrida’s second publication blitz, (the first being in 1967). In addition to the titular essay, it contains the very important essay on Plato, “Plato’s Pharmacy.” Like much of what Derrida wrote, this text is extremely difficult, and probably not a good starter text for Derrida. Nonetheless, it’s one of his more important books.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Edmund Husserl’s Origin of Geometry: An Introduction. Lincoln, Nebraska: University of Nebraska Press, 1989.
    • In 1962, Derrida translated an essay from very late in Husserl’s career, “The Origin of Geometry.” He also wrote a translator’s introduction to the essay—Husserl’s essay is about 18 pages long, while Derrida’s introduction is about 150 pages in length. This essay is of particular interest because it deals with the problem of how the ideal is constituted in the sphere of the subject; this will be a problem that will occupy Derrida up through the period of Voice and Phenomenon and beyond.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Margins of Philosophy. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1982.
    • This book is a collection of essays from the late-1960s up through the early 1970s, and is another from the 1972 publication blitz. It is very important for numerous reasons, but in no small part because it is here that his engagement with the work of Martin Heidegger, (which will occupy him throughout the remainder of his career), robustly begins. It contains some of the most important essays from Derrida’s mature work. Among them are the famous “Différance” essay, “The Ends of Man,” “Ousia and Grammē: Note on a Note from Being and Time,” “White Mythology,” (on the essential metaphoricity of language), and “Signature Event Context,” known for spawning the famous debate with John Searle over the work of J.L. Austin.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Of Grammatology. Translated by Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak. Baltimore and London: The JohnsHopkinsUniversity Press, 1974.
    • This book is one from the 1967 publication blitz, and is probably Derrida’s most famous work, among philosophers and non-philosophers alike. In addition, it is really one of the only book-length pieces Derrida wrote that is (at least the first part), merely programmatic and expository, as opposed to the prolonged engagements he typically undertakes with a particular text or thinker (the second part of the book is such an engagement, primarily with the thought of Jean-Jacques Rousseau). In this book we get extended discussions of the history of metaphysics, logocentrism, the privilege of voice over writing in the tradition, différance, trace, and supplementarity. It is also in this text that the infamous quote, “There is no outside-text,” is found.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Positions. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1981.
    • This book is from the 1972 group, and is a very short collection of interviews. It is highly recommended as a good starting-point for those approaching Derrida for the first time. Here Derrida lays out in very straightforward, programmatic terms, the stakes of the deconstructive project, unencumbered by deep textual analysis.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Voice and Phenomenon. Trans. Leonard Lawlor. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2011.
    • This is probably the single most important book that Derrida wrote. It is, like most of the rest of his work, a textual engagement with Husserl. Nevertheless, Derrida concentrates on a few key passages of Husserl’s works, most of which are cited in the body of Derrida’s work, such that a very basic knowledge of the Husserlian project makes reading Derrida’s text quite possible. It is in his engagement with Husserl, and the deconstruction of consciousness, that Derrida formulates the key concepts of différancetrace, and supplementarity, that will govern the direction of his work for most of the rest of his career. Derrida himself claims (in Positions) that this is his favorite of his books.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Writing and Difference. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1978.
    • This book is from the 1967 publication blitz, and it is a collection of Derrida’s early essays up through the mid-1960s. Here we get a very important essay on Michel Foucault that spawned the bitter fallout between the two for many years, the essay on Emmanuel Levinas that reoriented Levinas’ thinking, as well as demonstrated the broad and deep knowledge that Derrida had of the phenomenological tradition. In addition, this essay, “Violence and Metaphysics,” highlights the important role that Levinas will play in Derrida’s own thinking. There is also a very important essay on Freud and the trace, which is contemporaneous with the writing of Voice and Phenomenon.

b. Secondary Sources

There are many terrific volumes of secondary material on these two thinkers, but here are selected a few of the most relevant with respect to the themes explored in this article.

  • Bell, Jeffrey A. Philosophy at the Edge of Chaos. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 2006.
  • Bell, Jeffrey A. The Problem of Difference: Phenomenology and Poststructuralism. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1998.
    • Both of Bell’s books deal with the question of difference, and situate, primarily Deleuze but Derrida as well, within the larger context of the history of philosophical attempts to think about difference, including Plato, Aristotle, Whitehead, Descartes, and Kant.
  • Bogue, Ronald. Deleuze and Guattari. London and New York: Routledge, 1989.
    • Bogue’s text was one of the earlier attempts to write a comprehensive introductory text that took into account Deleuze’s historical engagements, along with his own philosophical articulations of his concepts, and the later political and aesthetic texts as well. This text is still a ‘standard’.
  • Bryant, Levi. Difference and Givenness: Deleuze’s Transcendental Empiricism and the Ontology of Immanence. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2008.
    • Bryant’s is one of the best books on Deleuze in recent years. It focuses primarily on Difference and Repetition, but examines the concept of transcendental empiricism, what it means to attempt to think the conditions of real experience, through the lens of Deleuze’s previous interactions with the thinkers who informed the research of Difference and Repetition.
  • De Beistigui, Miguel. Truth and Genesis: Philosophy as Differential Ontology. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2004.
    • De Beistigui, whose early works centered on the philosophy of Martin Heidegger, argues in this book that Deleuze completes the Heideggerian attempt to think difference, in that it is Deleuze who overcomes the humanism that Heidegger never quite escapes.
  • Descombes, Vincent. Modern French Philosophy. Trans. L. Scott-Fox and J.M. Harding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1980.
    • Descombes’ book was one of the first to attempt to capture the heart of French philosophy in the wake of Bergson. It is still one of the best, especially given its brevity. Chapters 5 and 6 are particularly relevant.
  • Gasché, Rodolphe. The Tain of the Mirror: Derrida and the Philosophy of Reflection. Cambridge and London: HarvardUniversity Press, 1986.
    • Gasché’s text was one of the earliest and most forceful attempts to situate Derrida’s thinking in the context of an explicit philosophical problem, the problem of critical reflection, complete with a long philosophical history. In the Anglophone world, Derrida’s work was at this time explored mostly in the context of Literary Theory departments. While that gave Derrida something of a ‘head start’ over the reception of Deleuze in the United States, it also created the unfortunate impression, throughout academic philosophy, that Derrida’s project was one of merely ‘playing’ with canonical texts. Gasché’s book corrected that misconception, and to this day it remains one of the best texts for understanding the overall thrust of Derrida’s project.
  • Hägglund, Martin. Radical Atheism: Derrida and the Time of Life. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2008.
    • Hägglund’s book enters into the oft-discussed theme of Derrida’s so-called religious turn in his later period. It is one of the best recent books on Derrida’s thinking, taking up the implications of a fully immanent analysis of temporality.
  • Hughes, Joe. Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation. London: Continuum International Publishing Group, 2008.
    • This book is one of the first to take up a close comparison of Deleuze with the philosophy of Husserl, boldly arguing that Deleuze’s project is marked from start to finish with a certain phenomenological impetus.
  • Lawlor, Leonard. Derrida and Husserl: The Basic Problem of Phenomenology. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2002.
    • Lawlor was one of the first American scholars to emphasize the centrality of Husserl to Derrida’s work. This book is particularly helpful because, inasmuch as it deals with the entirety of Derrida’s engagement with Husserl (from 1953 up through Voice and Phenomenon and beyond), it provides a rigorous but accessible explication of the early formation of Derrida’s project. It is without question one of the best books on Derrida available.
  • Marrati, Paola. Genesis and Trace: Derrida Reading Husserl and Heidegger. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2005.
    • This book, first published in French in 1998, explores the origins of the deconstructive project in Derrida’s engagement with the phenomenological tradition, and more specifically, with the question of time. It demonstrates and articulates the lasting significance of the Husserlian problematic up through Derrida’s immersion into Heidegger’s thought, and beyond.
  • Smith, Daniel W. Essays on Deleuze. Edinburgh: EdinburghUniversity Press, 2012.
    • Smith has for years been one of the leading voices in the world when it comes to Deleuze, and this 2012 volume at last collects all of his most important essays on Deleuze, along with a few new ones. Of particular interest is the essay on the simulacrum, the one on univocity, the one on the conditions of the new, and the comparative essay on Deleuze and Derrida.

c. Other Sources Cited in this Article

  • Aristotle. Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, Vol. 1. Ed. Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Aristotle. Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, Vol. 2. Ed. Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Duns Scotus. Philosophical Writings—A Selection. Trans. Allan B. Wolter. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1987.
  • Heraclitus. Fragments: A Text and Translation with a Commentary By T.M. Robinson. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1987.
  • Husserl, Edmund. The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology: An Introduction to Phenomenological Philosophy. Trans. David Carr. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1970.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, First Book. Trans. F. Kersten. Dordrecht, Boston, and London: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1998.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Logical Investigations Volume I. Ed. Dermot Moran. Trans. J.N. Findlay. New York: Routledge, 1970.
  • Husserl, Edmund. On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893-1917). Trans. John Barnett Brough. Dordrecht, Boston, and London: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991.
  • Hyppolite, Jean. Logic and Existence. Trans. Leonard Lawlor and Amit Sen. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1997.
  • Parmenides. Fragments: A Text and Translation with an Introduction By David Gallop. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1984.
  • Plato. Complete Works. Ed. John M. Cooper. Associate Ed. D.S. Hutchinson. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1997.
  • Spinoza. Complete Works. Ed. Michael L. Morgan. Trans. Samuel Shirley. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2002.


Author Information

Vernon W. Cisney
Gettysburg College
U. S. A.

Internalism and Externalism in the Philosophy of Mind and Language

This article addresses how our beliefs, our intentions, and other contents of our attitudes are individuated, that is, what makes those contents what they are. Content externalism (henceforth externalism) is the position that our contents depend in a constitutive manner on items in the external world, that they can be individuated by our causal interaction with the natural and social world. In the 20th century, Hilary Putnam, Tyler Burge and others offered Twin Earth thought experiments to argue for externalism. Content internalism (henceforth internalism) is the position that our contents depend only on properties of our bodies, such as our brains. Internalists typically hold that our contents are narrow, insofar as they locally supervene on the properties of our bodies or brains.

Although externalism is the more popular position, internalists such as David Chalmers, Gabriel Segal, and others have developed versions of narrow content that may not be vulnerable to typical externalist objections. This article explains the variety of positions on the issues and explores the arguments for and against the main positions. For example, externalism incurs problems of privileged access to our contents as well as problems about mental causation and psychological explanation, but externalists have offered responses to these objections.

Table of Contents

  1. Hilary Putnam and Natural Kind Externalism
  2. Tyler Burge and Social Externalism
  3. Initial Problems with the Twin Earth Thought Experiments
  4. Two Problems for Content Externalism
    1. Privileged Access
    2. Mental Causation and Psychological Explanation
  5. Different Kinds of Content Externalism
  6. Content Internalism and Narrow Content
    1. Jerry Fodor and Phenomenological Content
    2. Brian Loar and David Chalmers on Conceptual Roles and Two-Dimensional Semantics
    3. Radical Internalism
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Hilary Putnam and Natural Kind Externalism

In “The Meaning of ‘Meaning’” and elsewhere, Putnam argues for what might be called natural kind externalism. Natural kind externalism is the position that our natural kind terms (such as “water” and “gold”) mean what they do because we interact causally with the natural kinds that these terms are about. Interacting with natural kinds is a necessary (but not sufficient) condition for meaning (Putnam 1975, 246; Putnam 1981, 66; Sawyer 1998 529; Nuttecelli 2003, 172; Norris 2003, 153; Korman, 2006 507).

Putnam asserts that the traditional Fregean theory of meaning leaves a subject “as much in the dark as it ever was” (Putnam 1975, 215) and that it, and any descriptivist heirs to it, are mistaken in all their forms. To show this, Putnam insists that Frege accounts for the sense, intension, or meaning of our terms by making two assumptions:

  1. The meaning of our terms (for example, natural kind terms) is constituted by our being in a certain psychological state.
  2. The meaning of such terms determines its extension (Putnam 1975, 219).

Putnam concedes that assumptions one and two may seem appealing, but the conjunction of these assumptions is “…not jointly satisfied by any notion, let alone the traditional notion of meaning.” Putnam suggests abandoning the first while retaining a modified form of the second.

Putnam imagines that somewhere there is a Twin Earth. Earthlings and Twin Earthlings are exact duplicates (down to the last molecule) and have the same behavioral histories. Even so, there is one difference: the substance that we call water, on Twin Earth does not consist of H20, but of XYZ. This difference has not affected how the inhabitants of either planet use their respective liquids, but the liquids have different “hidden structures” (Putnam 1975, 235, 241; Putnam 1986, 288, Putnam 1988, 36). Putnam then imagines it is the year is 1750, before the development of chemistry on either planet. In this time, no experts knew of the hidden structure of water or of its twin, twater. Still, Putnam says, when the inhabitants of Earth use the term “water,” they still refer to the liquid made of H20; when the inhabitants of Twin Earth do the same, they refer to their liquid made of XYZ (Putnam 1975, 270).

The reason this is so, according to Putnam, is that natural kind terms like water have an “unnoticed indexical component.” Water, he says, receives its meaning by our originally pointing at water, such that water is always water “around here.” Putnam admits this same liquid relation “…is a theoretical relation, and may take an indefinite amount of investigation to determine” (Putnam 1975, 234). Given this, earthlings and their twin counterparts use their natural kind terms ((for example, “water,” “gold,” “cat,” and so forth), to refer to the natural kinds of their respective worlds (for example, on Earth, “water” refers to H20 but on Twin Earth it refers to XYZ). In other words, on each planet, twins refer to the “hidden structure” of the liquid of that planet. Thus, Putnam concludes that the first Fregean assumption is false, for while twins across planets are in the same psychological state, when they say “water,” they mean different things. However, understood correctly, the second assumption is true; when the twins say “water,” their term refers to the natural kind (that is, with the proper structural and chemical properties) of their world, and only to that kind.

Natural kind externalism, then, is the position that the meanings of natural kind terms are not determined by psychological states, but are determined by causal interactions with the natural kind itself (that is, kinds with certain structural properties). “Cut the pie any way you like,” Putnam says, “Meaning just ain’t in the head” (Putnam, 1975 227). However, soon after Putnam published “The Meaning of ‘Meaning,’” Colin McGinn and Tyler Burge noted that what is true of linguistic meaning extends to the contents of our propositional attitudes. As Burge says, the twins on Earth and Twin Earth “…are in no sense duplicates in their thoughts,” and this is revealed by how we ascribe attitudes to our fellows (Burge 1982b, 102; Putnam 1996, viii). Propositional attitude contents, it seems, are also not in our heads.

2. Tyler Burge and Social Externalism

In “Individualism and the Mental,” “Two Thought Experiments Reviewed,” “Other Bodies,” and elsewhere Tyler Burge argues for social externalism (Burge, 1979, 1982a, 1982b). Social externalism is the position that our attitude contents (for example, beliefs, intentions, and so forth) depend essentially on the norms of our social environments.

To argue for social externalism, Burge introduces a subject named Bert. Bert has a number of beliefs about arthritis, many of which are true, but in this case, falsely believes that he has arthritis in his thigh. While visiting his doctor, Bert says, “I have arthritis.” After hearing Bert's complaint, the doctor informs his patient that he is not suffering from arthritis. Burge then imagines a counterfactual subject – let us call him Ernie. Ernie is physiologically and behaviorally the same as Bert (non-intentionally described), but was raised in a different linguistic community. In Ernie's community, “arthritis” refers to a disease that occurs in the joints and muscles. When Ernie visits his doctor and mentions arthritis, he is not corrected.

Burge notes that although Ernie is physically and behaviorally the same as Bert, he “…lacks some – perhaps all – of the attitudes commonly attributed with content causes containing the word ‘arthritis…’” Given that arthritis is part of our linguistic community and not his, “it is hard to see how the patient could have picked up the notion of ‘arthritis’” (Burge 1979, 79; Burge 1982a, 286; Burge 1982b, 109). Although Bert and Ernie have always been physically and behaviorally the same, they differ in their contents. However, these differences “…stem from differences outside the patient.” As a result, Burge concludes: “it is metaphysically or constitutively necessary that in order to have a thought about arthritis one must be in relations to others who are in a better position to specify the disease” (Burge 1988, 350; Burge 2003b, 683; Burge 2007, 154).

Unlike Putnam, Burge does not restrict his externalism to natural kinds, or even to obvious social kinds. Regardless of the fact that our fellows suffer incomplete understanding of terms, typically we “take discourse literally” (Burge 1979, 88). In such situations, we still have “… assumed responsibility for communal conventions governing language symbols,” and given this, maintain the beliefs of our home communities (Burge 1979, 114). Burge states that this argument

…does not depend, for example, on the kind of word “arthritis” is. We could have used an artifact term, an ordinary natural kind word, a color adjective, a social role term, a term for a historical style, an abstract noun, an action verb, a physical movement verb, or any of other various sorts of words (Burge 1979, 79).

In other papers, Burge launches similar thought experiments to extend his externalism to cases where we have formed odd theories about artifacts (for example, where we believe sofas to be religious artifacts), to the contents of our percepts (for example, to our perceptions of, say, cracks or shadows on a sidewalk), and even to our memory contents (Burge 1985, 1986, 1998). Other externalists—William Lycan, Michael Tye, and Jonathan Ellis among them—rely on similar thought experiments to extend externalism to the contents of our phenomenal states, or seemings (Lycan 2001; Tye 2008; Ellis 2010). Externalism, then, can seem to generalize to all contents.

3. Initial Problems with the Twin Earth Thought Experiments

Initially, some philosophers found Putnam's Twin Earth thought experiments misleading. In an early article, Eddy Zemach pointed out that Putnam had only addressed the meaning of water in 1750, “…before the development of modern chemistry” (Zemach 1976; 117). Zemach questions whether twins pointing to water “around here” would isolate the right liquids (that is, with H20 on Earth and XYX on Twin Earth). No, such pointing would not have done this, especially long ago; Putnam just stipulates that “water” on Earth meant H20 and on Twin Earth meant XYZ, and that “water” means the same now (Zemach 1976, 123). D. H. Mellor adds that, in point of fact, “specimens are causally downwind of the usage they are supposed to constrain.  They are chosen to fit botanical and genetic knowledge, not the other way around” (Mellor 1977, 305; Jackson 1998, 216; Jackson 2003, 61).

In response to this criticism, externalists have since developed more nuanced formulations of the causal theory of reference, downplaying supposed acts of semantic baptism (for example, “this is water”). The theoretical adjustments can then account for how natural kind term meanings can change or diminish the role of referents altogether (Sainsbury 2007). Zemach, Mellor, Jackson, and others infer that Putnam should have cleaved to the first Fregean principle (that our being in a certain psychological state constitutes meaning) as well as to the second. By combining both Fregean principles, earthlings and their twins, mean the same thing after all.

Similarly, Kent Bach, Tim Crane, Gabriel Segal, and others argue that since Bert incompletely understands “arthritis,” he does not have the contents that his linguistic community does (that is, that the disease refers only to the joints). Given his misunderstanding of “arthritis,” Bert would make odd inferences about the disease, but “these very inferences constitute the evidence for attributing to the patient some notion other than arthritis” (Bach 1987, 267). Crane adds that since Bert and Ernie would have “…all the same dispositions to behavior in the actual and counterfactual situations,” they have the same contents (Crane 1991, 19; Segal 2000, 81). However, Burge never clarifies how much understanding Bert needs to actually have arthritis.(Burge 1986, 702; Burge 2003a, 276). Burge admits, “when a person incompletely understands an attitude, he has some other content that more or less captures his understanding” (Burge 1979, 95). If Bert does have some other content ­– perhaps, “tharthritis”– there is little motive to insist that he also has arthritis. Bert and Ernie, it seems, have the same contents.

According to these criticisms, the Twin Earth thought experiments seem to show that twins across planets, or in those raised in different linguistic communities, establish differing contents by importing questionable assumptions such as; that the causal theory of reference is true, that we refer to hidden structural properties, or dictate norms for ascribing contents. Without these assumptions, the Twin Earth thought experiments can easily invoke internalist intuitions. When experimental philosophers tested such thought experiments, they elicited different intuitions. At the very least, these philosophers say, “intuitions about cases continue to underdetermine the selection of the correct theory of reference” (Machery, Mallon, Nichols, and Stich 2009, 341).

4. Two Problems for Content Externalism

a. Privileged Access

René Descartes famously insisted that he could not be certain he had a body: “…if I mean only to talk of my sensation, or my consciously seeming to see or to walk, it becomes quite true because my assertion refers only to my mind.” In this view, privileged access (that is, a priori knowledge) to our content would seem to be true.

However, as Paul Boghossian has argued, externalism may not be able to honor this apparent truism. Boghossian imagines that we earthlings have slowly switched from Earth to Twin Earth, unbeknownst to us. As a result, he proposes that the externalist theory would not allow for discernment of whether contents refer to water or twater, to arthritis or tharthritis (Boghossian 1989, 172; Boghossian 1994, 39). As Burge sees the challenge, the problem is that "…[a] person would have different thoughts under the switches, but the person would not be able to compare the situations and note when and where the differences occurred (Burge 1988, 653; Burge 1998, 354; Burge 2003a, 278).

Boghossian argues that since externalism seems to imply that we cannot discern whether our contents refer to water or twater, arthritis or tharthritis, then we do not have privileged access to the proper contents. Either the approach for understanding privileged access is in need of revision (for example, restricting the scope of our claims to certain a priori truths), or externalism is itself false.

In response, Burge and others claim the “enabling conditions” (for example, of having lived on Earth or Twin Earth) to have water or twater, arthritis or tharthritis, the referential contents need not be known. As long as the enabling conditions are satisfied, first-order contents can be known (for example, “that is water” or “I have arthritis”); this first-order knowledge gives rise to our second-order reflective contents about them. Indeed, our first-order thoughts (that is, about objects) completely determine the second-order ones (Burge 1988, 659). However, as Max de Gaynesford and others have argued, when considering switching cases, one cannot assume that such enabling conditions are satisfied. Since we may be incorrect about such enabling conditions, and may be incorrect about our first-order attitude contents as well, then we may be incorrect about our reflective contents too (de Gaynesford 1996, 391).

Kevin Falvey and Joseph Owens have responded that although we cannot discern among first order contents, doing so is unnecessary. Although the details are “large and complex,” our contents are always determined by the environment where we happen to be, eliminating the possibility of error (Falvey and Owens 1994, 118). By contrast, Burge and others admit that contents are individuated gradually by “how the individual is committed” to objects. and that this commitment is constituted by other factors (Burge 1988, 652, Burge 1998, 352; Burge 2003a, 252). If we were suddenly switched from Earth to Twin Earth, or back again, our contents would not typically change immediately. Externalism, Burge concedes, is consistent with our having “wildly mistaken beliefs” about our enabling conditions (for example, about where we are) and so allows for errors about our first-order contents, as well as reflections upon them (Burge 2003c, 344). Because there is such a potential to be mistaken about enabling conditions, perhaps we do need to know them after all.

Other externalists have claimed that switching between Earth and Twin Earth is not a “relevant alternative”. Since such a switch is not relevant, they say, our enabling conditions (that is, conditions over time) are what we take them to be, such that we have privileged access to our first-order contents, and to our reflections on these (Warfield 1997, 283; Sawyer 1999, 371). However, as Peter Ludlow has argued, externalists cannot so easily declare switching cases to be irrelevant (Ludlow 1995, 48; Ludlow 1997, 286). As many externalists concede, relevant switching cases are easy to devise. Moreover, externalists cannot both rely on fictional Twin Earth thought experiments to generate externalist intuitions yet also object to equally fictional switching cases launched to evoke internalist intuitions. Either all such cases of logical possibility are relevant or none of them are (McCulloch 1995, 174).

Michael McKinsey, Jessica Brown and others offer another set of privileged access objections to externalism. According to externalism, they say, we do have privileged access to our contents (for example, to those expressed by water or twater, or arthritis or tharthritis). Given such access, we should be able to infer, by conceptual implication, that we are living in a particular environment (for example, on a planet with water and arthritis, on a planet twater and tharthritis, and so forth). Externalism, then, should afford us a priori knowledge of our actual environments (McKinsey 1991, 15; Brown 1995, 192; Boghossian 1998, 208). Since privileged access to our contents does not afford us a priori knowledge of our environments (the latter always remaining a posteriori), externalism implies that we possess knowledge we do not have.

Externalists, such as Burge, Brian McLaughlin and Michael Tye, Anthony Brueckner, and others have proposed that privileged access to our contents does not afford any a priori knowledge of our environments. Since we can be mistaken about natural kinds in our actual environment (for example, we may even discover that there are no kinds) the facts must be discovered. Actually, as long as objects exist somewhere, we can form contents about them just by hearing others theorize about them (Burge 1982, 114; Burge 2003c, 344; Brueckner 1992, 641; Gallois and O’Leary-Hawthorne 1996, 7; Ball 2007, 469). Although external items individuate contents, our privileged access to those contents does not afford us a priori knowledge of our environments (such details always remaining a posteriori). However, if we can form contents independent of the facts of our environment (for example, if we can have “x,” “y,” or “z” contents about x, y, or z objects when these objects have never existed around us), then externalism seems to be false in principle. Externalists must explain how this possibility does not compromise their position, or they must abandon externalism (Boghossian 1998, 210; Segal 2000, 32, 55; Besson 2012, 420).

Some externalists, Sarah Sawyer and Bill Brewer among them, have responded to this privilege access objection by suggesting that, assuming externalism is true, we can only think about objects by the causal interaction we have with them. Since this is so, privileged access to our contents allows us to infer, by conceptual implication, that those very objects exist in our actual environments. In other words, externalism affords us a priori knowledge of our environments after all (Sawyer 1998, 529-531; Brewer 2000, 416). Perhaps this response is consistent, but it requires privileged access to our contents by itself determine a priori knowledge of our environments.

b. Mental Causation and Psychological Explanation

Jerry Fodor, Colin McGinn, offer a second objection to externalism based in scientific psychology. When explaining behavior, psychologists typically cite local contents as causes of our behavior. Psychologists typically ascribe twins the same mental causes and describe twins as performing the same actions (Fodor 1987, 30; McGinn 1982, 76-77; Jacob 1992, 208, 211). However, according to externalism, contents are individuated in relation to different distal objects. Since twins across planets relate to different objects, they have different mental causes, and so should receive different explanations. Yet as Fodor and McGinn note, since the only differences between twins across planets are the relations they bear to such objects, those objects are not causally relevant. As Jacob says, the difference between twin contents and behavior seems to drop out as irrelevant (Jacob 1992, 211). Externalism, then, seems to violate principles of scientific psychology, rendering mental causation and psychological explanation mysterious (Fodor 1987, 39; McGinn 1982, 77).

Externalists, such as Burge, Robert van Gulick, and Robert Wilson have responded that, when considering mental causation and psychological explanation, local causes are important. There is still good reason to individuate contents between planets by the relation twins bear to distal (and different) objects (Burge 1989b, 309; Burge 1995, 231; van Gulick 1990; 156; Wilson 1997, 141). Externalists have also noted that any relations we bear to such objects may yet be causally relevant to behavior, albeit indirectly (Adams, Drebushenko, Fuller, and Stecker 1990, 221-223; Peacocke 1995, 224; Williamson 2000, 61-64). However, as Fodor, Chalmers, and others have argued, our relations to such distal and different objects are typically not causal but only conceptual (Fodor 1991b 21; Chalmers 2002a, 621). Assuming this is so, psychologists do not yet have any reason to prefer externalist recommendations for the individuation of content, since these practices do not distinguish the causal from the conceptual aspects of our contents.

5. Different Kinds of Content Externalism

Historically, philosophers as diverse as Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel, Martin Heidegger, and Ludwig Wittgenstein have all held versions of externalism. Putnam and Burge utilize Twin Earth thought experiments to argue for natural kind and social externalism, respectively, which they extend to externalism about artifacts, percepts, memories, and phenomenal properties. More recently, Gareth Evans and John McDowell, Ruth Millikan, Donald Davidson, Andy Clark and David Chalmers have developed four more types of externalism – which do not primarily rely upon Twin Earth thought experiments, and which differ in their motivations, scopes and strengths.

Gareth Evans, John McDowell adapt neo-Fregean semantics to launch a version of externalism for demonstrative thoughts (for example, this is my cat). In particular, we bear a “continuing informational link” to objects (for example, cats, tables, and so forth) where we can keep track of them, as manifested in a set of abilities (Evans 1982, 174). Without this continuing informational link and set of abilities, Evans says, we can only have “mock thoughts” about such objects. Such failed demonstrative thoughts appear to have contents, but in fact, do not (Evans 1981, 299, 302; McDowell 1986, 146; McCulloch 1989, 211-215). Evans and McDowell conclude that when we express demonstrative thoughts, our contents about them are individually dependent on the objects they represent. In response, some philosophers have questioned whether there is any real difference between our successful and failed demonstrative thoughts (that is, rendering the latter mock thoughts). Demonstrative thoughts, successful or not, seem to have the same contents and we seem to behave the same regardless (Segal 1989; Noonan 1991).

Other externalists – notably David Papineau and Ruth Garrett Millikan – employ teleosemantics to argue that contents are determined by proper causes, or those causes that best aid in our survival. Millikan notes that when thoughts are “developed in a normal way,” they are “a kind of cognitive response to” certain substances and that it is this process that determines content (Millikan 2004, 234). Moreover, we can “make the same perceptual judgment from different perspectives, using different sensory modalities, under different mediating circumstances” (Millikan 2000, 103). Millikan claims that improperly caused thoughts may feel the same as genuine thoughts, but have no place in this system. Therefore, contents are, one and all, dependent on only proper causes. However, some philosophers have responded that the prescribed contents can be produced in aberrant ways and aberrant contents can be produced by proper causes. Contents and their proper causes may be only contingently related to one another (Fodor 1990).

Donald Davidson offers a third form of externalism that relies on our basic linguistic contact with the world, on the causal history of the contents we derive from language, and the interpretation of those contents by others. Davidson insists that

…in the simplest and most basic cases, words and sentences derive their meaning from the objects and circumstances in whose presence they were learned (Davidson 1989, 44; Davidson, 1991; 197).

In such cases, we derive contents from the world directly; this begins a causal history where we can manifest the contents. An instantly created swampman – a being with no causal history – could not have the contents we have, or even have contents at all (Davidson 1987, 19). Since our contents are holistically related to each other as interpreters, we must find each other to be correct in most things. Interpretations, however, change what our contents are and do so essentially (Davidson 1991, 211). Davidson concludes that our contents are essentially dependent on our basic linguistic contact with the world, our history of possessing such contents, and on how others interpret us. In response, some philosophers have argued that simple basic linguistic contact with the world, from which we derive specific contents directly, may not be possible. A causal history may not be relevant to our having contents and the interpretations by others may have nothing to do with content (Hacker 1989; Leclerc 2005).

Andy Clark and David Chalmers have developed what has been called “active externalism,” which addresses the vehicles of content – our brains. When certain kinds of objects (for example, notebooks, mobile phones, and so forth) are engaged to perform complex tasks, the objects change the vehicles of our contents as well as how we process information. When processing information, we come to rely upon objects (for example, phones), such that they literally become parts of our minds, parts of our selves (Clark and Chalmers 1998; Clark 2010). Clark and Chalmers conclude that our minds and selves are “extended” insofar as there is no boundary between our bodies, certain objects, and our social worlds. Indeed, other externalists have broadened active or vehicle externalism to claim that there are no isolated persons at all (Noe 2006; Wilson 2010). Philosophers have suggested various ways to draw a boundary between the mind and objects, against active or vehicle externalism (Adams and Aizawa 2010). Other philosophers have responded that because active or vehicle externalism implies that the mind expands to absorb objects, it is not externalism at all (Bartlett 2008).

These newer forms of externalism do not rely on Twin Earth thought experiments. Moreover, these forms of externalism do not depend on the causal theory of reference, reference to hidden structural properties, incomplete understanding, or dictated norms for ascribing content. Consequently, these newer forms of externalism avoid various controversial assumptions in addition to any problems associated with them. However, even if one or more of these externalist approaches could overcome their respective objections, all of them, with the possible exception of active or vehicle externalism (which is not universally regarded as a form of externalism) must still face the various problems associated with privileged access, mental causation, and psychological explanation.

6. Content Internalism and Narrow Content

Internalism proposes that our contents are individuated by the properties of our bodies (for example, our brains), and these alone. According to this view, our contents locally supervene on the properties of our bodies. In the history of philosophy, René Descartes, David Hume, and Gottlob Frege have defended versions of internalism. Contemporary internalists typically respond to Twin Earth thought experiments that seem to evoke externalist intuitions. Internalists offer their own thought experiments (for example, brain in a vat experiments) to invoke internalist intuitions. For example, as David Chalmers notes, clever scientists could arrange a brain such that it has

...the same sort of inputs that a normal embodied brain receives…the brain is connected to a giant computer simulation of the world. The simulation determines which inputs the brain receives. When the brain produces outputs, these are fed back into the simulation. The internal state of the brain is just like that of a normal brain (Chalmers 2005, 33).

Internalists argue that such brain in vat experiments are coherent; they contend that brains would have the same contents as they do without their having any causal interaction with objects. It follows that neither brains in vats nor our contents are essentially dependent on the environment (Horgan, Tienson and Graham 2005; 299; Farkas 2008, 285). Moderate internalists, such as Jerry Fodor, Brian Loar, and David Chalmers, who accept Twin Earth inspired externalist intuitions, insofar as they agree that some contents are broad (that is, some contents are individuated by our causally interacting with objects). However, these philosophers also argue that some contents are narrow (that is, some contents depending only on our bodies) Radical internalists, such as Gabriel Segal, reject externalist intuitions altogether and argue that all content is narrow.

Moderate and radical internalists are classed as internalists because they all develop accounts of narrow content, or attempt to show how contents are individuated by the properties of our bodies. Although these accounts of narrow content differ significantly, they are all designed to have particular features. First, narrow content is intended to mirror our perspective, which is the unique set of contents in each person, regardless of how aberrant these turn out to be. Second, narrow content is intended to mirror our patterns of reasoning – again regardless of aberrations. Third, narrow content is intended to be relevant to mental causation and to explaining our behavior, rendering broad content superfluous for that purpose (Chalmers 2002a, 624, 631). As internalists understand narrow content, then, our unique perspective, reasoning, and mental causes are all important – especially when we hope to understand the precise details of ourselves and our fellows.

a. Jerry Fodor and Phenomenological Content

In his early work, Jerry Fodor developed a version of moderate internalism. Fodor concedes that the Twin Earth thought experiments show that some of our contents (for example, water or twater) are broad. Still, for the purposes of scientific psychology, he argues, we must construct some content that respects “methodological solipsism,” which in turn explains why the twins are psychologically the same. Consequently, Fodor holds that narrow content respects syntax, or does so “without reference to the semantic properties of truth and reference” (Fodor 1981, 240; Fodor 1982, 100). Phenomenologically, the content of “water is wet” is something like "…a universally quantified belief with the content that all the potable, transparent, sailable-on…and so forth, kind of stuff is wet (Fodor 1982, 111)." However, soon after Fodor offered this phenomenological version of narrow content, many philosophers noted that if such content by itself has nothing to do with truth or reference it is hard to see how this could be content, or how it could explain our behavior (Rudder-Baker 1985, 144; Adams, Drebushenko, Fuller, and Stecker 1990, 217).

Fodor responded by slightly changing his position. According to his revised position, although narrow content respects syntax, contents are functions, or “mappings of thoughts and contexts onto truth conditions” (for example, the different truth conditions that obtain on either planet). In other words, before we think any thought in context we have functions that determine that when we are on one planet we have certain contents and when on the other we will have different ones. If we were switched with our twin, our thoughts would still match across worlds (Fodor 1987, 48). However, Fodor concedes, independent of context, we cannot say what narrow contents the twins share (that is, across planets). Still, he insists that we can approach these contents, albeit indirectly (Fodor 1987, 53). In other words, we can use broad contents understood in terms of “primacy of veridical tokening of symbols” and then infer narrow contents from them (Fodor 1991a, 268). Fodor insists that while twins across worlds have different broad contents, they have the same narrow functions that determine these contents.

But as Robert Stalnaker, Ned Block, and others have argued, if narrow contents are but functions that map contexts of thoughts onto truth conditions, they do not themselves have truth conditions – arguably, they are not contents. Narrow content, in this view, is just syntax (Stalnaker 1989, 580; Block 1991, 39, 51). Even if there was a way to define narrow content so that it would not reduce to syntax, it would still be difficult to say what about the descriptions must be held constant for them to perform the function of determining different broad contents on either planet (Block 1991, 53). Lastly, as Paul Bernier has noted, even if we could settle on some phenomenological descriptions to be held constant across planets, we could not know that any tokening of symbols really did determine their broad contents correctly (Bernier 1993, 335).

Ernest Lepore, Barry Loewer, and others have added that even if narrow contents could be defined as functions that map thoughts and contexts onto truth conditions, and even if these were short phenomenological descriptions, parts of the descriptions (for example, water or twater “…is wet,” or arthritis or tharthritis “…is painful” and so forth) might themselves be susceptible to new externalist thought experiments. If we could run new thought experiments on terms like “wet” or “painful,” those terms may not be narrow (Lepore and Loewer 1986, 609; Rowlands 2003, 113). Assuming that this is possible, there can be no way to pick out the truly narrow component in such descriptions, rendering this entire account of narrow content hopeless.

In the early 21st century, proponents of “phenomenal intentionality” defended this phenomenological version of narrow content. Experience, these philosophers say, must be characterized as the complex relation that “x presents y to z,” where z is an agent. In other words, agents are presented with various apparent properties, relations, and so forth, all with unique feels. Moreover, these presentations can be characterized merely by using “logical, predicative, and indexical expressions” (Horgan, Tienson, and Graham 2005, 301). These philosophers insist the phenomenology of such presentations is essential to them, such that all who share them also share contents. Phenomenal intentionality, then, is narrow (Horgan, Tienson, and Graham 2005, 302; Horgan and Kriegel 2008, 360). Narrow contents, furthermore, have narrow truth conditions. The narrow truth conditions of “that picture is crooked” may be characterized as "…there is a unique object x, located directly in front of me and visible by me, such that x is a picture and x is hanging crooked (Horgan, Tienson, and Graham 2005, 313)."

Defenders of phenomenological intentionality insist that although it is difficult to formulate narrow truth conditions precisely, we still share them with twins and brains in vats – although brains will not have many of their conditions satisfied (Horgan, Tienson, and Graham 315; Horgan 2007, 5). Concerning the objections to this account, if phenomenology is essential to content, there is little worry that content will reduce to syntax, about what part of content should be held constant across worlds, or about new externalist thought experiments. Externalists, of course, argue that phenomenology is not essential to content and that phenomenology is not narrow (Lycan 2001; Tye 2008; Ellis 2010). Because proponents of phenomenological intentionality hold that phenomenology is essential to content, they can respond that such arguments beg the question against them.

b. Brian Loar and David Chalmers on Conceptual Roles and Two-Dimensional Semantics

Brian Loar, David Chalmers, and others have developed another version of moderate internalism. Loar and Chalmers concede that the Twin Earth thought experiments show that some contents are broad (for example, water, twater or arthritis, tharthritis, and so forth), but also argue that our conceptual roles are narrow. Conceptual roles, these philosophers say, mirror our perspective and reasoning, and are all that is relevant to psychological explanations.

Conceptual roles, Colin McGinn notes, can be characterized by our “subjective conditional probability function on particular attitudes. In other words, roles are determined by our propensity to “assign probability values” to attitudes, regardless of how aberrant these attitudes turn out to be (McGinn 1982 234). In a famous series of articles, Loar adds that we experience such roles subjectively as beliefs, desires, and so forth. Such subjective states, he says, are too specific to be captured in public discourse and only have “psychological content,” or the content that is mirrored in how we conceive things (Loar 1988a, 101; Loar 1988b, 127). When we conceive things in the same way (for example, as twins across worlds do), we have the same contents. When we conceive things differently (for example, when we have different evaluations of a place), we have different contents. However, Loar admits that psychological contents do not themselves have truth conditions but only project what he calls “realization conditions,” or the set of possible worlds where contents “…would be true,” or satisfied (Loar 1988a, 108; Loar 1988b, 123). Loar concedes that without truth conditions psychological contents may seem odd, but they are narrow. In other words, psychological contents project realization conditions and do so regardless of whether or not these conditions are realized (Loar 1988b, 135).

David Chalmers builds on this conceptual role account of narrow content but defines content in terms of our understanding of epistemic possibilities. When we consider certain hypotheses, he says, it requires us to accept some things a priori and to reject others. Given enough information about the world, agents will be “…in a position to make rational judgments about what their expressions refer to” (Chalmers 2006, 591). Chalmers defines scenarios as “maximally specific sets of epistemic possibilities,” such that the details are set (Chalmers 2002a, 610). By dividing up various epistemic possibilities in scenarios, he says, we assume a “centered world” with ourselves at the center. When we do this, we consider our world as actual and describe our “epistemic intensions” for that place, such that these intentions amount to “…functions from scenarios to truth values” (Chalmers 2002a, 613). Epistemic intensions, though, have epistemic contents that mirror our understanding of certain qualitative terms, or those terms that refer to “certain superficial characteristics of objects…in any world” and reflect our ideal reasoning (for example, our best reflective judgments) about them (Chalmers 2002a, 609; Chalmers 2002b, 147; Chalmers 2006, 586). Given this, our “water” contents are such that "If the world turns out one way, it will turn out that water is H20; if the world turns out another way, it will turn out that water is XYZ" (Chalmers 2002b, 159).

Since our “water” contents constitute our a priori ideal inferences, the possibility that water is XYZ may remain epistemically possible (that is, we cannot rule it out a priori). Chalmers insists that given this background, epistemic contents really are narrow, because we evaluate them prior to whichever thoughts turn out to be true, such that twins (and brains in vats) reason the same (Chalmers 2002a, 616; Chalmers 2006, 596). Lastly, since epistemic contents do not merely possess realization conditions or conditions that address “…what would have been” in certain worlds but are assessed in the actual world, they deliver “epistemic truth conditions” for that place (Chalmers 2002a, 618; Chalmers 2002b, 165; Chalmers 2006, 594). Epistemic contents, then, are not odd but are as valuable as any other kind of content. In sum, Chalmers admits that while twins across worlds have different broad contents, twins (and brains) still reason exactly the same, and must be explained in the same way. Indeed, since cognitive psychology “…is mostly concerned with epistemic contents” philosophy should also recognize their importance (Chalmers, 2002a, 631).

However, as Robert Stalnaker and others have argued, if conceptual roles only have psychological contents that project realization conditions, we can best determine them by examining broad contents and then extracting narrow contents (Stalnaker 1990, 136). If this is how we determine narrow contents, they are merely derivative and our access to them is limited. However, Stalnaker says, that if psychological contents have actual truth conditions, then they are broad (Stalnaker 1990, 141). Chalmers, though, has responded that on his version of the position, our a priori ideal evaluations of epistemic possibilities in scenarios yields epistemic intensions with epistemic contents, and these contents have epistemic truth conditions of their own. Given these changes, he says, the problems of narrow content do not arise for him. Still, as Christian Nimtz and others have argued, epistemic contents seem merely to be qualitative descriptions of kinds, and so fall victim to typical modal and epistemological objections to descriptivist theories of reference (Nimtz 2004, 136). Similarly, as Alex Byrne and James Pryor argue, because such descriptions do not yield “substantive identifying knowledge” of kinds, it is doubtful we can know what these contents are, or even that they exist (Byrne and Pryor 2006, 45, 50). Lastly, other externalists have responded that the qualitative terms we use to express capture epistemic contents must be semantically neutral. However, since such neutral terms are not available, such contents are beyond our ken (Sawyer 2008, 27-28).

Chalmers has responded that although epistemic contents can be phrased descriptively, “there is no reason to think that grasping an epistemic intension requires any sort of descriptive articulation by a subject” (Chalmers 2002b, 148). Since this is so, he says, theory is not committed to the description theory of reference. Similarly, Chalmers insists that as long as we have enough information about the world, we do not require substantive identifying knowledge of kinds, but only “…a conditional ability” to identify them (Chalmers 2006, 600). Some philosophers have postulated that repeated contact with actual or hypothetical referents may change and refine it, and others have suggested that this ability may include abductive reasoning (Brogaard 2007, 320). However, Chalmers denies that this objection applies to his position because the conditional ability to identify kinds concerns only our ideal reasoning (for example, our best reflective judgments). Chalmers concedes that our qualitative language must be semantically neutral, but he insists that once we have enough information about the world, “…a qualitative characterization… will suffice” (Chalmers 2006, 603). Such a characterization, he says, will guarantee that twins (and brains in vats) have contents with the same epistemic truth conditions.

c. Radical Internalism

Unlike moderate internalists such as Fodor, Loar, and Chalmers, Gabriel Segal makes the apparently radical move of rejecting Twin Earth inspired externalist intuitions altogether (Segal, 2000, 24). Radical internalism offers the virtues of not needing to accommodate externalism, and of avoiding typical criticisms of narrow content. Internalists, Segal says, are not required to concede that some of our contents are broad and then to develop versions of narrow contents as phenomenology, epistemic contents, or conceptual roles beyond this. Indeed, he insists that this move has always been an “unworkable compromise” at best (Segal 2000, 114). Rather, as Segal says, narrow content is…a variety of ordinary representation” (Segal 2000, 19).

Segal notes that when offering Twin Earth thought experiments, externalists typically assume that the causal theory of reference is true, that we refer to hidden structural properties, can have contents while incompletely understanding them, and assume tendentious norms for ascribing contents. Moreover, Segal says, externalists seem unable to account for cases of referential failure (for example, cases of scientific failure), and so their account of content is implausible on independent grounds (Segal 2000, 32, 55). When all this is revealed, he says, our intuitions about content can easily change, and do. Interpreted properly, in this view, the Twin Earth thought experiments do not show that our contents are broad, but rather reveals “psychology, as it is practiced by the folk and the scientist, is already, at root, internalist” (Segal 2000, 122).

Segal describes our narrow contents as “motleys,” or organic entities that can “persist through changes of extension” yet still evolve. Motleys “…leave open the possibility of referring to many kinds,” depending on the circumstances (Segal 2000, 77, 132). Although Segal disavows any general method for determining when contents change or remain the same, he insists that we can employ various charitable means to determine this. When there is any mystery, we can construct neologisms to be more accurate. Neologisms allow us to gauge just how much our fellows deviate from us, and even to factor these deviations out (Segal 2000, 141; Segal 2008, 16). Regardless of these details, motleys are shared by twins (and brains in vats). Segal suggests that we follow the lead of experimental psychologists who track the growth and changes in our concepts by using scientific methods and models, but who only recognize narrow contents (Segal 2000, 155).

Importantly, because Segal rejects Twin Earth inspired externalist intuitions, externalists cannot accuse his version of narrow content of not being content, or of being broad content in disguise, without begging the question against him. Still, as Jessica Brown has argued, his account is incomplete. Segal, she notes, assumes a neo-Fregean account of content which she paraphrases as

If S rationally assents to P (t1) and dissents from or abstains from the truth value of P (t2), where P is in an extensional context, then for S, t1 and t2 have different contents, and S associates different concepts with them (Brown 2002, 659).

Brown insists that Segal assumes this neo-Fregean principle, but “…fails to provide any evidence” for it (Brown 2002, 660). Given this lacuna in his argument, she says, externalists might either try to accommodate this principle, or to reject it outright. Externalists have done both. Although Segal does not explicitly defend this neo-Fregean principle, he begins an implicit defense elsewhere (Segal 2003, 425). Externalists, by contrast, have struggled to accommodate this neo-Fregean principle and those externalists who have abandoned it have rarely offered replacements (Kimbrough 1989, 480).

Because Segal bases his radical internalism on rejecting externalist intuitions altogether, its very plausibility rests on this. Externalists typically take their intuitions about content obvious and expect others to agree. Still, as Segal notes, although externalist intuitions are popular, it is reasonable to reject them. By doing this, he hopes to “reset the dialectical balance” between externalism and internalism (Segal 2000, 126). Radical internalism, he says, may not be so radical after all.

7. Conclusion

Externalism and internalism, as we have seen, address how we individuate the content of our attitudes, or address what makes those contents what they are. Putnam, Burge, and other externalists insist that contents can be individuated by our causal interaction with the natural and social world. Externalists seem to incur problems of privileged access to our contents as well as problems about mental causation and psychological explanation. Externalist responses to these issues have been numerous, and have dominated the literature. By contrast, Chalmers, Segal, and other content internalists argue that contents can be individuated by our bodies. Internalists, though, have faced the charge that since narrow content does not have truth conditions, it is not content. Moreover, if such content does have truth conditions it is just broad content in disguise. Internalist responses to these charges have ranged from trying to show how narrow content is not vulnerable to these criticisms, to suggesting that the externalist intuitions upon which the charges rest should themselves be discarded.

Externalists and internalists have very different intuitions about the mind. Externalists seem unable to imagine minds entirely independent of the world (repeatedly claiming that possibility revises our common practices, or is incoherent in some way). By contrast, internalists see the split between mind and world as fundamental to understanding ourselves and our fellows, and so concentrate on questions of perspective, reasoning, and so forth. Given the contrasting intuitions between externalists and internalists, both sides often mischaracterize the other and see the other as clinging to doubtful, biased, or even incoherent conventions. Unless some way to test such intuitions is developed, proponents of both sides will continue to cleave to their assumptions in the debate, convinced that the burden of proof must be borne by the opposition.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, F., Drebushenko, D., Fuller, G., and Stecker., R. 1990. “Narrow Content: Fodor's Folly.” Mind and Language 5, 213-229.
  • Adams, F. & Aizawa, K. 2010. “Defending the Bounds of Cognition.” In R. Menary (ed.) The Extended Mind, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 67-80.
  • Bach, K. 1987. Thought and Reference. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ball, D. 2007. “Twin Earth Externalism and Concept Possession.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 85.3, 457-472.
  • Bartlett G. 2008. “Whither Internalism. How Should Internalists Respond to the Extended Mind.” Metaphilosophy 39.2, 163-184.
  • Bernecker, S. 2010. Memory: a Philosophical Study. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bernier, P. 1993. “Narrow Content, Context of Thought, and Asymmetric Dependency.” Mind and Language 8, 327-342.
  • Besson, C. 2012. “Externalism and Empty Natural Kind Terms.” Erkenntnis 76, 403-425.
  • Biggs, Stephen & Wilson, Jessica. (forthcoming). “Carnap, the Necessary A Posteriori, and Metaphysical Nihilism.” In Stephan Blatti and Sandra Lapointe (eds.) Ontology After Carnap. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Block, N., 1991. “What Narrow Content is Not.” In Lepore and Rey eds., Meaning and Mind: Fodor and His Critics. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 33-64.
  • Boghossian, P. 1989. “Content and Self-Knowledge.” In Ludlow and Martin eds., Externalism and Self-Knowledge. Stanford: CSLI Publications, 149-175.
  • Boghossian, P. 1994. “The Transparency of Mental Content.” Philosophical Perspectives 8, 33-50.
  • Boghossian, P. 1998. “What Can the Externalist Know A Priori?” Philosophical Issues 9, 197-211.
  • Brewer, B. 2000. “Externalism and A Priori Knowledge of Empirical Facts.” In Peacocke and Boghossian eds., New Essays on the A Priori. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brogaard, B. 2007. “That May Be Jupiter: A Heuristic for Thinking Two-Dimensionally.” American Philosophical Quarterly 44.4, 315-328.
  • Brown, J. 1995. “The Incompatibility of Anti-Individualism and Privileged Access.” Analysis 55.3, 149-156.
  • Brown, J. 2002. “Review of ‘A Slim Book about Narrow Content’.” Philosophical Quarterly, 657-660.
  • Brueckner, A. 1992. “What the Anti-Individualist can Know A Priori.” Reprinted in Chalmers, ed. The Philosophy of Mind: Classic and Contemporary Readings. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 639-651.
  • Burge, T. 1979. “Individualism and the Mental.” In French, P., Uehling, T., and Wettstein, H., eds., Midwest Studies in Philosophy 4. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 73-121.
  • Burge, T. 1982a. “Two Thought Experiments Reviewed.” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 23.3, 284-293.
  • Burge, T. 1982b. “Other Bodies.” In Woodfield, Andrew, ed., Thought and Object: Essays on Intentionality. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 97-121.
  • Burge, T. 1985. “Cartesian Error and the Objectivity of Perception.” In: Pettit, P. and McDowell, J., eds. Subject, Thought, and Context. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 117-135.
  • Burge, T. 1986 “Intellectual Norms and the Foundations of Mind.” Journal of Philosophy 83, 697-720.
  • Burge, T. 1988. “Individualism and Self-Knowledge.” Journal of Philosophy 85, 647-663.
  • Burge, T. 1989a. “Wherein is Language Social?” Reprinted in Owens J. ed., Propositional Attitudes: The Role of Content in Logic, Language and Mind Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 113-131.
  • Burge, T. 1989b. "Individuation and Causation in Psychology.” In Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 303-322.
  • Burge, T. 1995. “Intentional Properties and Causation.” In C. Macdonald (ed.), Philosophy of Psychology: Debates on Psychological Explanation. Cambridge: Blackwell, 225-234.
  • Burge, T. 1998. “Memory and Self-Knowledge.” In Ludlow and Martin eds., Externalism and Self-Knowledge. Stanford: CLSI Publications, 351-370.
  • Burge, T. 2003a. “Replies from Tyler Burge.” In Frapolli, M. and Romero, E., eds. Meaning, Basic Self-Knowledge, and Mind. Stanford, Calif.: CSLI Publications, 250-282.
  • Burge, T. 2003b. “Social Anti-Individualism, Objective Reference.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 73, 682-692.
  • Burge, T. 2003c. “Some Reflections on Scepticism: Reply to Stroud.” In Martin Hahn & B. Ramberg (eds.), Reflections and Replies: Essays on the Philosophy of Tyler Burge. Mass: MIT Press, 335-346.
  • Burge, T., 2007. “Postscript to ‘Individualism and the Mental.’” Reprinted in Foundations of Mind, by Tyler Burge. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 151-182.
  • Byrne, A. and J. Pryor, 2006, “Bad Intensions.” In Two-Dimensional Semantics: Foundations and Applications, M. Garcia-Carprintero and J. Macia (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 38–54.
  • Chalmers, D. 2002a. “The Components of Content.” Reprinted in Chalmers, ed. The Philosophy of Mind: Classic and Contemporary Readings. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 607-633.
  • Chalmers, D. 2002b. “On Sense and Intension.” In Philosophical Perspectives; Language and Mind, 16, James Tomberlin, ed., 135-182.
  • Chalmers, D. 2005. “The Matrix as Metaphysics.” Reprinted in Philosophy and Science Fiction: From Time Travel to Super Intelligence, ed. Schneider, S. London: Wiley-Blackwell Press, 33-53.
  • Chalmers, D. 2006. “Two-Dimensional Semantics.” In Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Language, E. Lepore and B. Smith eds., Oxford: Oxford University Press, 575–606.
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  • Clark, A. 2010. Supersizing the Mind: Embodiment, Action, and Cognitive Extension. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Crane, T. 1991. “All the Difference in the World.” Philosophical Quarterly 41, 3-25.
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Author Information

Basil Smith
Saddleback College
U. S. A.

Michel Foucault: Political Thought

Michel FoucaultThe work of twentieth-century French philosopher Michel Foucault has increasingly influenced the study of politics. This influence has mainly been via concepts he developed in particular historical studies that have been taken up as analytical tools; “governmentality” and ”biopower” are the most prominent of these. More broadly, Foucault developed a radical new conception of social power as forming strategies embodying intentions of their own, above those of individuals engaged in them; individuals for Foucault are as much products of as participants in games of power.

The question of Foucault’s overall political stance remains hotly contested. Scholars disagree both on the level of consistency of his position over his career, and the particular position he could be said to have taken at any particular time. This dispute is common both to scholars critical of Foucault and to those who are sympathetic to his thought.

What can be generally agreed about Foucault is that he had a radically new approach to political questions, and that novel accounts of power and subjectivity were at its heart. Critics dispute not so much the novelty of his views as their coherence. Some critics see Foucault as effectively belonging to the political right because of his rejection of traditional left-liberal conceptions of freedom and justice. Some of his defenders, by contrast, argue for compatibility between Foucault and liberalism. Other defenders see him either as a left-wing revolutionary thinker, or as going beyond traditional political categories.

To summarize Foucault’s thought from an objective point of view, his political works would all seem to have two things in common: (1) an historical perspective, studying social phenomena in historical contexts, focusing on the way they have changed throughout history; (2) a discursive methodology, with the study of texts, particularly academic texts, being the raw material for his inquiries. As such the general political import of Foucault’s thought across its various turns is to understand how the historical formation of discourses have shaped the political thinking and political institutions we have today.

Foucault’s thought was overtly political during one phase of his career, coinciding exactly with the decade of the 1970s, and corresponding to a methodology he designated “genealogy”. It is during this period that, alongside the study of discourses, he analysed power as such in its historical permutations. Most of this article is devoted to this period of Foucault’s work. Prior to this, during the 1960s, the political content of his thought was relatively muted, and the political implications of that thought are contested. So, this article is divided into thematic sections arranged in order of the chronology of their appearance in Foucault’s thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Foucault’s Early Marxism
  2. Archaeology
  3. Genealogy
  4. Discipline
  5. Sexuality
  6. Power
  7. Biopower
  8. Governmentality
  9. Ethics
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary
    2. Secondary

1. Foucault’s Early Marxism

Foucault began his career as a Marxist, having been influenced by his mentor, the Marxist philosopher Louis Althusser, as a student to join the French Communist Party. Though his membership was tenuous and brief, Foucault’s later political thought should be understood against this background, as a thought that is both under the influence of, and intended as a reaction to, Marxism.

Foucault himself tells us that after his early experience of a Stalinist communist party, he felt sick of politics, and shied away from political involvements for a long time. Still, in his first book, which appeared in 1954, less than two years after Foucault had left the Party, his theoretical perspective remained Marxist. This book was a history of psychology, published in English as Mental Illness and Psychology. In the original text, Foucault concludes that mental illness is a result of alienation caused by capitalism. However, he excised this Marxist content from a later edition in 1962, before suppressing publication of the book entirely; an English translation of the 1962 edition continues to be available only by an accident of copyright (MIP vii). Thus, one can see a trajectory of Foucault’s decisively away from Marxism and indeed tendentially away from politics.

2. Archaeology

Foucault’s first major, canonical work was his 1961 doctoral dissertation, The History of Madness. He gives here a historical account, repeated in brief in the 1962 edition of Mental Illness and Psychology, of what he calls the constitution of an experience of madness in Europe, from the fifteenth to the nineteenth centuries. This encompasses correlative study of institutional and discursive changes in the treatment of the mad, to understand the way that madness was constituted as a phenomenon. The History of Madness is Foucault’s longest book by some margin, and contains a wealth of material that he expands on in various ways in much of his work of the following two decades. Its historical inquiry into the interrelation of institutions and discourses set the pattern for his political works of the 1970s.

Foucault saw there as being three major shifts in the treatment of madness in the period under discussion. The first, with the Renaissance, saw a new respect for madness. Previously, madness had been seen as an alien force to be expelled, but now madness was seen as a form of wisdom. This abruptly changed with the beginning of the Enlightenment in the seventeenth century. Now rationality was valorized above all else, and its opposite, madness, was excluded completely. The unreasonable was excluded from discourse, and congenitally unreasonable people were physically removed from society and confined in asylums. This lasted until the end of the eighteenth century, when a new movement “liberating” the mad arose. For Foucault, however, this was no true liberation, but rather the attempt by Enlightenment reasoning to finally negate madness by understanding it completely, and cure it with medicine.

The History of Madness thus takes seriously the connection between philosophical discourse and political reality. Ideas about reason are not merely taken to be abstract concerns, but as having very real social implications, affecting every facet of the lives of thousands upon thousands of people who were considered mad, and indeed, thereby, altering the structure of society. Such a perspective represents a change in respect of Foucault’s former Marxism. Rather than attempt to ground experience in material circumstances, here it might seem that cultural transformation is being blamed for the transformation of society. That is, it might seem that Foucault had embraced idealism, the position that ideas are the motor force of history, Marxism’s opposite. This would, however, be a misreading. The History of Madness posits no causal priority, either of the cultural shift over the institutional, or vice versa. It simply notes the coincident transformation, without etiological speculation. Moreover, while the political forces at work in the history of madness were not examined by Foucault in this work, it is clearly a political book, exploring the political stakes of philosophy and medicine.

Many were convinced that Foucault was an idealist, however, by later developments in his thought. After The History of Madness, Foucault began to focus on the discursive, bracketing political concerns almost entirely. This was first, and most clearly, signalled in the preface to his next book, The Birth of the Clinic. Although the book itself essentially extends The History of Madness chronologically and thematically, by examining the birth of institutional medicine from the end of the eighteenth century, the preface is a manifesto for a new methodology that will attend only to discourses themselves, to the language that is uttered, rather than the institutional context. It is the following book in Foucault’s sequence, rather than The Birth of the Clinic itself, that carried this intention to fulfilment: this book was The Order of Things (1966). Whereas in The History of Madness and The Birth of the Clinic, Foucault had pursued historical researches that had been relatively balanced between studying conventional historical events, institutional change, and the history of ideas, The Order of Things represented an abstract history of thought that ignored almost anything outside the discursive. This method was in effect what was at that time in France called “structuralism,” though Foucault was never happy with this use of this term. His specific claims were indeed quite unique, namely that in the history of academic discourses, in a given epoch, knowledge is organized by an episteme, which governs what kind of statements can be taken as true. The Order of Things charts several successive historical shifts of episteme in relation to the human sciences.

These claims led Foucault onto a collision with French Marxism. This could not have been entirely unintended by Foucault, in particular because in the book he specifically accuses Marxism of being a creature of the nineteenth century that was now obsolete. He also concluded the work by indicating his opposition to humanism, declaring that “man” (the gendered “man” here refers to a concept that in English we have come increasingly to call the “human”) as such was perhaps nearing obsolescence. Foucault here was opposing a particular conception of the human being as a sovereign subject who can understand itself. Such humanism was at that time the orthodoxy in French Marxism and philosophy, championed the pre-eminent philosopher of the day, Jean-Paul Sartre, and upheld by the French Communist Party’s central committee explicitly against Althusser just a month before The Order of Things was published (DE1 36). In its humanist form, Marxism cast itself as a movement for the full realization of the individual. Foucault, by contrast, saw the notion of the individual as a recent and aberrant idea. Furthermore, his entire presumption to analyse and criticize discourses without reference to the social and economic system that produced them seemed to Marxists to be a massive step backwards in analysis. The book indeed seems to be apolitical: it refuses to take a normative position about truth, and accords no importance to anything outside abstract, academic discourses. The Order of Things proved so controversial, its claims so striking, that it became a best-seller in France, despite being a lengthy, ponderous, scholarly tome.

Yet, Foucault’s position is not quite as anti-political as has been imagined. The explicit criticism of Marxism in the book was specifically of Marx’s economic doctrine: it amounts to the claim that this economics is essentially a form of nineteenth century political economy. It is thus not a total rejection of Marxism, or dismissal of the importance of economics. His anti-humanist position was not in itself anti-Marxist, inasmuch as Althusser took much the same line within a Marxist framework, albeit one that tended to challenge basic tenets of Marxism, and which was rejected by the Marxist establishment. This shows it is possible to use the criticism of the category of “man” in a pointedly political way. Lastly, the point of Foucault’s “archaeological” method of investigation, as he now called it, of looking at transformations of discourses in their own terms without reference to the extra-discursive, does not imply in itself that discursive transformations can be explained without reference to anything non-discursive, only that they can be mapped without any such reference. Foucault thus shows a lack of interest in the political, but no outright denial of the importance of politics.

Foucault was at this time fundamentally oriented towards the study of language. This should not in itself be construed as apolitical. There was a widespread intellectual tendency in France during the 1960s to focus on avant-garde literature as being the main repository for radical hopes, eclipsing a traditional emphasis on the politics of the working class. Foucault wrote widely during this period on art and literature, publishing a book on the obscure French author Raymond Roussel, which appeared on the same day as The Birth of the Clinic. Given Roussel’s eccentricity, this was not far from his reflections on literature in The History of Madness. For Foucault, modern art and literature are essentially transgressive. Transgression is something of a common thread running through Foucault’s work in the 1960s: the transgression of madness and literary modernism is for Foucault directly implicated in the challenge he sees emerging to the current episteme. This interest in literature culminated in what is perhaps Foucault’s best known piece in this relation, ”What Is an Author?”, which combines some of the themes from his final book of the sixties, The Archaeology of Knowledge, with reflections on modern literature in challenging the notion of the human “author” of a work in whatever genre. All of these works, no matter how abstract, can be seen as having important political-cultural stakes for Foucault. Challenging the suzerainty of “man” can in itself be said to have constituted his political project during this period, such was the importance he accorded to discourses. The practical importance of such questions can be seen in The History of Madness.

Foucault was ultimately dissatisfied with this approach, however. The Archaeology of Knowledge, a reflective consideration of the methodology of archaeology itself, ends with an extraordinary self-critical dialogue, in which Foucault answers imagined objections to this methodology.

3. Genealogy

Foucault wrote The Archaeology of Knowledge while based in Tunisia, where he had taken a three-year university appointment in 1966. While the book was in its final stages, the world around him changed. Tunisia went through a political upheaval, with demonstrations against the government, involving many of his students. He was drawn into supporting them, and was persecuted as a result. Much better known and more significant student demonstrations occurred in Paris shortly afterwards, in May of 1968. Foucault largely missed these because he was in Tunis, but he followed news of them keenly.

He returned to France permanently in 1969. He was made the head of the philosophy department at a brand new university at Vincennes. The milieu he found on his return to France was itself highly politicized, in stark contrast to the relatively staid country he had left behind three years before. He was surrounded by peers who had become committed militants, not least his partner Daniel Defert, and including almost all of the colleagues he had hired to his department. He now threw himself into an activism that would characterize his life from that point on.

It was not long before a new direction appeared in his thought to match. The occasion this first became apparent was his 1970 inaugural address for another new job, his second in as many years, this time as a professor at the Collège de France, the highest academic institution in France. This address was published as a book in France, L’ordre du discours, “The Order of Discourse” (which is one of the multiple titles under which it has been translated in English). For the first time, Foucault sets out an explicit agenda of studying institutions alongside discourse. He had done this in the early 1960s, but now he proposed it as a deliberate method, which he called “genealogy.” Much of “The Order of Discourse” in effect recapitulates Foucault’s thought up to that point, the considerations of the history of madness and the regimes of truth that have governed scientific discourse, leading to a sketch of a mode of analysing discourse similar to that of The Archeology of Knowledge. In the final pages, however, Foucault states that he will now undertake analyses in two different directions, critical and “genealogical.” The critical direction consists in the study of the historical formation of systems of exclusion. This is clearly a turn back to the considerations of The History of Madness. The genealogical direction is more novel – not only within Foucault’s work, but in Western thought in general, though the use of the term “genealogical” does indicate a debt to one who came before him, namely Friedrich Nietzsche. The genealogical inquiry asks about the reciprocal relationship between systems of exclusion and the formation of discourses. The point here is that exclusion is not a fate that befalls innocent, pre-existing discourses. Rather, discourses only ever come about within and because of systems of exclusion, the negative moment of exclusion co-existing with the positive moment of the production of discourse. Now, discourse becomes a political question in a full sense for Foucault, as something that is intertwined with power.

“Power” is barely named as such by Foucault in this text, but it becomes the dominant concept of his output of the 1970s. This output comprises two major books, eight annual lecture series he gave at the Collège de France, and a plethora of shorter pieces and interviews. The signature concept of genealogy, combining the new focus on power with the older one on discourse, is his notion of “power-knowledge.” Foucault now sees power and knowledge as indissolubly joined, such that one never has either one without the other, with neither having causal suzerainty over the other.

His first lecture series at the Collège de France, now published in French as Leçons sur la volonté de savoir (“Lessons on the will to knowledge”), extends the concerns of “The Order of Discourse” with the production of knowledge. More overtly political material followed in the next two lecture series, between 1971 and 1973, both of which dealt with the prison system, and led up to Foucault’s first full-scale, published genealogy, 1975’s Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison.

4. Discipline

This research on prisons began in activism. The French state had banned several radical leftist groups in the aftermath of May 1968, and thousands of their members ended up in prisons, where they began to agitate for political rights for themselves, then began to agitate for rights for prisoners in general, having been exposed by their incarceration to ordinary prisoners and their problems. Foucault was the main organizer of a group formed outside the prison, in effect as an outgrowth of this struggle, the Groupe d’informations sur les prisons (the GIP – the Prisons Information Group). This group, composed primarily of intellectuals, sought simply to empower prisoners to speak of their experiences on their own account, by sending surveys out to them and collating their responses.

In tandem with this effort, Foucault researched the history of the prisons, aiming to find out something that the prisoners themselves could not tell him: how the prison system had come into being and what purpose it served in the broader social context. His history of the prisons turns out to be a history of a type of power that Foucault calls “disciplinary,” which encompasses the modern prison system, but is much broader. Discipline and Punish thus comprises two main historical theses. One, specifically pertaining to the prison system, is that this system regularly produces an empirically well-known effect, a layer of specialized criminal recidivists. This is for Foucault simply what prisons objectively do. Pointing this out undercuts the pervasive rationale of imprisonment that prisons are there to reduce crime by punishing and rehabilitating inmates. Foucault considers the obvious objection to this that prisons only produce such effects because they have been run ineffectively throughout their history, that better psychological management of rehabilitation is required, in particular. He answers this by pointing out that such discourses of prison reform have accompanied the prison system since it was first established, and are hence part of its functioning, indeed propping it up in spite of its failures by providing a constant excuse for its failings by arguing that it can be made to work differently.

Foucault’s broader thesis in Discipline and Punish is that we are living in a disciplinary society, of which the prison is merely a potent example. Discipline began not with the prisons, but originally in monastic institutions, spreading out through society via the establishment of professional armies, which required dressage, the training of individual soldiers in their movements so that they could coordinate with one another with precision. This, crucially, was a matter of producing what Foucault calls “docile bodies,” the basic unit of disciplinary power. The prison is just one of a raft of broadly similar disciplinary institutions that come into existence later. Schools, hospitals, and factories all combine similar methods to prisons for arranging bodies regularly in space, down to their minute movements. All combine moreover similar functions. Like the prison, they all have educational, economically productive, and medical aspects to them. The differences between these institutions is a matter of which aspect has primacy.

All disciplinary institutions also do something else that is quite novel, for Foucault: they produce a “soul” on the basis of the body, in order to imprison the body. This eccentric formulation of Foucault’s is meant to capture the way that disciplinary power has increasingly individualized people. Discipline and Punish begins with a vivid depiction of an earlier form of power in France, specifically the execution in 1757 of a man who had attempted to kill the King of France. As was the custom, for this, the most heinous of crimes in a political system focused on the person of the king, the most severe punishment was meted out: the culprit was publicly tortured to death. Foucault contrasts this with the routinized imprisonment that became the primary form of punishing criminals in the 19th century. From a form of power that punished by extraordinary and exemplary physical harm against a few transgressors, Western societies adopted a form of power that attempted to capture all individual behaviour. This is illustrated by a particular example that has become one of the best known images from Foucault’s work, the influential scheme of nineteenth century philosopher Jeremy Bentham called the “Panopticon,” a prison in which every action of the inmates would be visible. This serves as something of a paradigm for the disciplinary imperative, though it was never realized completely in practice.

Systems of monitoring and control nevertheless spread through all social institutions: schools, workplaces, and the family. While criminals had in a sense already been punished individually, they were not treated as individuals in the full sense that now developed. Disciplinary institutions such as prisons seek to develop detailed individual psychological profiles of people, and seek to alter their behaviour at the same level. Where previously most people had been part of a relatively undifferentiated mass, individuality being the preserve of a prominent or notorious few, and even then a relatively thin individuality, a society of individuals now developed, where everyone is supposed to have their own individual life story. This constitutes the soul Foucault refers to.

5. Sexuality

The thread of individualization runs through his next book, the first of what were ultimately three volumes of his History of Sexuality. He gave this volume the title The Will to Knowledge. It appeared only a year after Discipline and Punish. Still, three courses at the Collège de France intervene between his lectures on matters penitential and the book on sexuality. The first, Psychiatric Power, picks up chronologically where The History of Madness had left off, and applies Foucault’s genealogical method to the history of psychiatry. The next year, 1975, Foucault gave a series of lectures entitled Abnormal. These link together the studies on the prison with those on psychiatry and the question of sexuality through the study of the category of the abnormal, to which criminals, the mad, and sexual “perverts” were all assigned. Parts of these lectures indeed effectively reappear in The Will to Knowledge.

Like Discipline and Punish, the Will to Knowledge contains both general and specific conclusions. Regarding the specific problem of sexuality, Foucault couches his thesis as a debunking of a certain received wisdom in relation to the history of sexuality that he calls “the repressive hypothesis.” This is the view that our sexuality has historically been repressed, particularly in the nineteenth century, but that during the twentieth century it has been progressively liberated, and that we need now to get rid of our remaining hang-ups about sex by talking openly and copiously about it. Foucault allows the core historical claim that there has been sexual repressiveness, but thinks that this is relatively unimportant in the history of sexuality. Much more important, he thinks, is an injunction to talk about our sexuality that has consistently been imposed even during the years of repressiveness, and is now intensified, ostensibly for the purpose of lifting our repression. Foucault again sees a disciplinary technique at work, namely confession. This began in the Catholic confessional, with the Church spreading the confessional impulse in relation to sex throughout society in the early modern period. Foucault thinks this impulse has since been made secular, particularly under the auspices of institutional psychiatry, introducing a general compulsion for everyone to tell the truth about themselves, with their sexuality a particular focus. For Foucault, there is no such thing as sexuality apart from this compulsion. That is, sexuality itself is not something that we naturally have, but rather something that has been invented and imposed.

The implication of his genealogy of sexuality is that “sex” as we understand it is an artificial construct within this recent “device” (dispositif) of sexuality. This includes both the category of the sexual, encompassing certain organs and acts, and “sex” in the sense of gender, an implication spelt out by Foucault in his introduction to the memoirs of Herculine Barbin, a nineteenth century French hermaphrodite, which Foucault discovered and arranged to have published. Foucault’s thought, and his work on sexuality in particular, has been immensely influential in the recent “third wave” of feminist thought. The interaction of Foucault and feminism is the topic of a dedicated article elsewhere in this encyclopedia.

6. Power

The most general claim of The Will to Knowledge, and of Foucault’s entire political thought, is his answer to the question of where machinations such as sex and discipline come from. Who and what is it that is responsible for the production of criminality via imprisonment? Foucault’s answer is, in a word, “power.” That is to say that no one in particular is producing these things, but that rather they are effects generated by the interaction of power relations, which produce intentions of their own, not necessarily shared by any individuals or institutions. Foucault’s account of power is the broadest of the conclusions of The Will to Knowledge. Although similar reflections on power can be found in Discipline and Punish and in lectures and interviews of the same period, The Will to Knowledge gives his most comprehensive account of power. Foucault understands power in terms of “strategies” which are produced through the concatenation of the power relations that exist throughout society, wherever people interact. As he explains in a later text, “The Subject and Power,” which effectively completes the account of power given in The Will to Knowledge, these relations are a matter of people acting on one another to make other people act in turn. Whenever we try to influence others, this is power. However, our attempts to influence others rarely turn out the way we expect; moreover, even when they do, we have very little idea what effects our actions on others’ have more broadly. In this way, the social effects of our attempts to influence other people run quite outside of our control or ken. This effect is neatly encapsulated in a remark attributed to Foucault that we may know what we do, but we do not know what what we do does. What it does is produce strategies that have a kind of life of their own. Thus, although no one in the prison system, neither the inmates, nor the guards, nor politicians, want prisons to produce a class of criminals, this is nonetheless what the actions of all the people involved do.

Controversy around Foucault’s political views has focused on his reconception of power. Criticisms of him on this point invariably fail, however, to appreciate his true position or beg the question against it by simply restating the views he has rejected. He has been interpreted as thinking that power is a mysterious, autonomous force that exists independently of any human influence, and is so all-encompassing as to preclude any resistance to it. Foucault clearly states in The Will to Knowledge that this is not so, though it is admittedly relatively difficult to understand his position, namely that resistance to power is not outside power. The point here for Foucault is not that resistance is futile, but that power is so ubiquitous that in itself it is not an obstacle to resistance. One cannot resist power as such, but only specific strategies of power, and then only with great difficulty, given the tendency of strategies to absorb apparently contradictory tendencies. Still, for Foucault power is never conceived as monolithic or autonomous, but rather is a matter of superficially stable structures emerging on the basis of constantly shifting relations underneath, caused by an unending struggle between people. Foucault explains this in terms of the inversion of Clausewitz’s dictum that war is diplomacy by other means into the claim that “politics is war by other means.” For Foucault, apparently peaceful and civilized social arrangements are supported by people locked in a struggle for supremacy, which is eternally susceptible to change, via the force of that struggle itself.

Foucault is nevertheless condemned by many liberal commentators for his failure to make any normative distinction between power and resistance, that is, for his relativism. This accusation is well founded: he consistently eschews any kind of overtly normative stance in his thought. He thus does not normatively justify resistance, but it is not clear there is any inherent contradiction in a non-normative resistance. This idea is coherent, though of course those who think it is impossible to have a non-normative political thought (which is a consensus position within political philosophy) will reject him on this basis. For his part, he offers only analyses that he hopes will prove useful to people struggling in concrete situations, rather than prescriptions as to what is right or wrong.

One last accusation, coming from a particularly noteworthy source, the most prominent living German philosopher, Jürgen Habermas, should also be mentioned. This accusation is namely that Foucault’s account of power is “functionalist.” Functionalism in sociology means taking society as a functional whole and thus reading every part as having distinct functions. The problem with this view is that society is not designed by anyone and consequently much of it is functionally redundant or accidental. Foucault does use the vocabulary of “function” on occasion in his descriptions of the operations of power, but does not show any allegiance to or even awareness of functionalism as a school of thought. His position in any case is not that society constitutes a totality or whole via any necessity: functions exist within strategies that emerge spontaneously from below, and the functions of any element are subject to change.

7. Biopower

Foucault’s position in relation to resistance implies not so much that one is defeated before one begins as that one must proceed with caution to avoid simply supporting a strategy of power while thinking oneself rebellious. This is for him what has happened in respect of sexuality in the case of the repressive hypothesis. Though we try to liberate ourselves from sexual repression, we in fact play into a strategy of power which we do not realize exists. This strategy is for everyone to constitute themselves as “‘subjects’ in both senses of the word,” a process Foucault designates “subjection” (assujettissement). The two senses here are passive and active. On the one hand, we are subjected in this process, made into passive subjects of study by medical professionals, for example. On the other, we are the subjects in this process, having to actively confess our sexual proclivities and indeed in the process develop an identity based on this confessed sexuality. So, power operates in ways that are both overtly oppressive and more positive.

Sexuality for Foucault has a quite extraordinary importance in the contemporary network of power relations. It has become the essence of our personal identity, and sex has come to be seen as “worth dying for.” Foucault details how sexuality had its beginnings as a preoccupation of the newly dominant bourgeois class, who were obsessed with physical and reproductive health, and their own pleasure. This class produced sexuality positively, though one can see that it would have been imposed on women and children within that class quite regardless of their wishes. For Foucault, there are four consistent strategies of the device of sexuality: the pathologisation of the sexuality of women and children, the concomitant medicalization of the sexually abnormal “pervert,” and the constitution of sexuality as an object of public concern. From its beginning in the bourgeoisie, Foucault sees public health agencies as imposing sexuality more crudely on the rest of the populace, quite against their wishes.

Why has this happened? For Foucault, the main explanation is how sexuality ties together multiple “technologies of power”, namely discipline on the one hand, and a newer technology, which he calls “bio-politics,” on the other. In The Will to Knowledge, Foucault calls this combination of discipline and bio-politics together “bio-power,” though confusingly he elsewhere seems to use “bio-power” and “bio-politics” as synonyms, notably in his 1976 lecture series, Society Must Be Defended. He also elsewhere dispenses with the hyphens in these words, as it will in the present article hereafter.

Biopolitics is a technology of power that grew up on the basis of disciplinary power. Where discipline is about the control of individual bodies, biopolitics is about the control of entire populations. Where discipline constituted individuals as such, biopolitics does this with the population. Prior to the invention of biopolitics, there was no serious attempt by governments to regulate the people who lived in a territory, only piecemeal violent interventions to put down rebellions or levy taxes. As with discipline, the main precursor to biopolitics can be found in the Church, which is the institution that did maintain records of births and deaths, and did minister to the poor and sick, in the medieval period. In the modern period, the perception grew among governments that interventions in the life of the people would produce beneficial consequences for the state, preventing depopulation, ensuring a stable and growing tax base, and providing a regular supply of manpower for the military. Hence they took an active interest in the lives of the people. Disciplinary mechanisms allowed the state to do this through institutions, most notably perhaps medical institutions that allowed the state to monitor and support the health of the population. Sex was the most intense site at which discipline and biopolitics intersected, because any intervention in population via the control of individual bodies fundamentally had to be about reproduction, and also because sex is one of the major vectors of disease transmission. Sex had to be controlled, regulated, and monitored if the population was to be brought under control.

There is another technology of power in play, however, older than discipline, namely “sovereign power.” This is the technology we glimpse at the beginning of Discipline and Punish, one that works essentially by violence and by taking, rather than by positively encouraging and producing as both discipline and biopolitics do. This form of power was previously the way in which governments dealt both with individual bodies and with masses of people. While it has been replaced in these two roles by discipline and biopower, it retains a role nonetheless at the limits of biopower. When discipline breaks down, when the regulation of the population breaks down, the state continues to rely on brute force as a last resort. Moreover, the state continues to rely on brute force, and the threat of it, in dealing with what lies outside its borders.

For Foucault, there is a mutual incompatibility between biopolitics and sovereign power. Indeed, he sometimes refers to sovereign power as “thanatopolitics,” the politics of death, in contrast to biopolitics’s politics of life. Biopolitics is a form of power that works by helping you to live, thanatopolitics by killing you, or at best allowing you to live. It seems impossible for any individual to be simultaneously gripped by both forms of power, notwithstanding a possible conflict between different states or state agencies. There is a need for a dividing line between the two, between who is to be “made to live,” as Foucault puts it, and who is to be killed or simply allowed to go on living indifferently. The most obvious dividing line is the boundary between the population and its outside at the border of a territory, but the “biopolitical border,” as it has been called by recent scholars, is not the same as the territorial border. In Society Must Be Defended, Foucault suggests there is a device he calls “state racism,” that comes variably into play in deciding who is to receive the benefits of biopolitics or be exposed to the risk of death.

Foucault does not use this term in any of the works he published himself, but nevertheless does point in The Will to Knowledge to a close relationship between biopolitics and racism. Discourses of scientific racism that emerged in the nineteenth century posited a link between the sexual “degeneracy” of individuals and the hygiene of the population at large. By the early twentieth century, eugenics, the pseudo-science of improving the vitality of a population through selective breeding, was implemented to some extent in almost all industrialized countries. It of course found its fullest expression in Nazi Germany. Nevertheless, Foucault is quite clear that there is something quite paradoxical about such attempts to link the old theme of “blood” to modern concerns with population health. The essential point about “state racism” is not then that it necessarily links to what we might ordinarily understand as racism in its strict sense, but that there has to be a dividing line in modern biopolitical states between what is part of the population and what is not, and that this is, in a broad sense, racist.

8. Governmentality

After the publication of The Will to Knowledge, Foucault took a one-year hiatus from lecturing at the Collège de France. He returned in 1978 with a series of lectures that followed logically from his 1976 ones, but show a distinct shift in conceptual vocabulary. Talk of “biopolitics” is almost absent. A new concept, “governmentality,” takes its place. The lecture series of 1978 and 1979, Security, Territory, Population and The Birth of Biopolitics, center on this concept, despite the somewhat misleading title of the latter in this regard.

“Governmentality” is a portmanteau word, derived from the phrase “governmental rationality.” A governmentality is thus a logic by which a polity is governed. But this logic is for Foucault, in keeping with his genealogical perspective (which he still affirms), not merely ideal, but rather encompasses institutions, practices and ideas. More specifically, Foucault defines governmentality in Security, Territory, Population as allowing for a complex form of “power which has the population as its target, political economy as its major form of knowledge, and apparatuses of security as its essential technical instrument” (pp. 107–8). Confusingly, however, Foucault in the same breath also defines other senses in which he will use the term “governmentality.” He will use it not only to describe this recent logic of government, but as the longer tendency in Western history that has led to it, and the specific process in the early modern period by which modern governmentality was formed.

“Governmentality” is a slippery concept then. Still, it is an important one. Governmentality seems to be closely contemporaneous and functionally isomorphic with biopolitics, hence seems to replace it in Foucault’s thought. That said, unlike biopolitics, it never figures in a major publication of his – he only allowed one crucial lecture of Security, Territory, Population to be published under the title of “Governmentality,” in an Italian journal. It is via the English translation of this essay that this concept has become known in English, this one essay of Foucault’s in fact inspiring an entire school of sociological reflection.

What is the meaning of this fuzzy concept then? Foucault never repudiates biopower. During these lectures he on multiple occasions reaffirms his interest in biopower as an object of study, and does so as late as 1983, the year before he died. The meaning of governmentality as a concept is to situate biopower in a larger historical moment, one that stretches further back in history and encompasses more elements, in particular the discourses of economics and regulation of the economy.

Foucault details two main phases in the development of governmentality. The first is what he identifies as raison d’État, literally “reason of state.” This is the central object of study of Security, Territory, Population. It correlates the technology of discipline, as an attempt to regulate society to the fullest extent, with what was contemporaneously called “police.” This governmentality gave way by the eighteenth century to a new form of governmentality, what will become political liberalism, which reacts against the failures of governmental regulation with the idea that society should be left to regulate itself naturally, with the power of police applied only negatively in extremis. This for Foucault is broadly the governmentality that has lasted to this day, and is the object of study of The Birth of Biopolitics in its most recent form, what is called “neo-liberalism.” With this governmentality, we see freedom of the individual and regulation of the population subtly intertwined.

9. Ethics

The 1980s see a significant turn in Foucault’s work, both in terms of the discourses he attends to and the vocabulary he uses. Specifically, he focuses from now on mainly on Ancient texts from Greece and Rome, and prominently uses the concepts of “subjectivity” and “ethics.” None of these elements is entirely new to his work, but they assume novel prominence and combination at this point.

There is an article elsewhere in this encyclopedia about Foucault’s ethics. The question here is what the specifically political import of this ethics is. It is often assumed that the meaning of Foucault’s ethics is to retract his earlier political thought and thus to recant on that political project, retreating from political concerns towards a concern with individual action. There is a grain of truth to such allegations, but no more than a grain. While certainly Foucault’s move to the consideration of ethics is a move away from an explicitly political engagement, there is no recantation or contradiction of his previous positions, only the offering of an account of subjectivity and ethics that might enrich these.

Foucault’s turn towards subjectivity is similar to his earlier turn towards power: he seeks to add a dimension to the accounts and approach he has built up. As in the case of power, he does so not by helping himself to an available approach, but by producing a new one: Foucault’s own account of subjectivity is original and quite different to the extant accounts of subjectivity he rejected in his earlier work. Subjectivity for Foucault is a matter of people’s ability to shape their own conduct. In this way, his account relates to his previous work on government, with subjectivity a matter of the government of the self. It is thus closely linked to his political thought, as a question of the power that penetrates the interior of the person.

“Ethics” too is understood in this terms. Foucault does not produce an “ethics” in the sense that the word is conventionally used today to mean a normative morality, nor indeed does he produce a “political philosophy” in the sense that that phrase is conventionally used, which is to say a normative politics. “Ethics” for Foucault is rather understood etymologically by reference to Ancient Greek reflection on the ethike, which is to say, on character. Ancient Greek ethics was marked by what Foucault calls the “care of the self”: it is essentially a practice of fashioning the self. In such practices, Foucault sees a potential basis for resistance to power, though he is clear that no truly ethical practices exist today and it is by no means clear that they can be reestablished. Ethics has, on the contrary, been abnegated by Christianity with its mortificatory attitude to the self. This account of ethics can be found primarily in Foucault’s last three lecture series at the Collège de France, The Hermeneutics of the Subject, The Government of the Self and Others and The Courage of the Truth.

10. References and Further Reading

English translations of works by Foucault named above, in the order they were originally written.

a. Primary

    • Mental illness and psychology. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1987.
    • The History of Madness. London: Routledge, 2006.
    • Birth of the Clinic. London: Routledge, 1989.
    • The Order of Things. London: Tavistock, 1970.
    • The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon, 1972.
    • "The order of discourse," in M. Shapiro, ed., Language and politics (Blackwell, 1984), pp. 108-138. Translated by Ian McLeod.
    • Psychiatric Power. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2006.
    • Discipline and Punish. London: Allen Lane, 1977.
    • Abnormal. London: Verso, 2003.
    • Society Must Be Defended. New York: Picador, 2003.
    • An Introduction. Vol. 1 of The History of Sexuality. New York: Pantheon, 1978. Reprinted as The Will to Knowledge, London: Penguin, 1998.
    • Security, Territory, Population. New York: Picador, 2009
    • The Birth of Biopolitics. New York: Picador, 2010
    • "Introduction" M. Foucault, ed., Herculine Barbin: being the recently discovered memoirs of a nineteenth-century French hermaphrodite Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980, pp. vii-xvii. Translated by Richard McDougall.
    • “The Subject and Power,” J. Faubion, ed., Power. New York: New Press, 2000, pp. 326-348.
    • The Hermeneutics of the Subject. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2005.
    • The Government of the Self and Others. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2010.
    • The Courage of the Truth. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2011.

The shorter writings and interviews of Foucault are also of extraordinary interest, particularly to philosophers. In French, these have been published in an almost complete collection, Dits et écrits, by Gallimard, first in four volumes and more recently in a two-volume edition. In English, Foucault’s shorter works are spread across many overlapping anthologies, which even between them omit much that is important. The most important of these anthologies for Foucault’s political thought are:

  • J. Faubion, ed., Power Vol. 3, Essential Works. New York: New Press, 2000.
  • Colin Gordon, ed., Power/Knowledge. Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980.

b. Secondary

  • Graham Burchell, Colin Gordon and Peter Miller (eds.), The Foucault Effect. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1991.
    • An edited collection that is a mixture of primary and secondary sources. Both parts of the book have been extraordinarily influential. If constitutes a decent primer on governmentality.
  • Gilles Deleuze, Foucault. Trans. Seán Hand. London: Athlone, 1988.
    • The best book about Foucault’s work, from one who knew him. Though predictably idiosyncratic, it is still a pointedly political reading.
  • David Couzens Hoy (ed.), Foucault: A Critical Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 1986.
    • An excellent selection of critical essays, mostly specifically political.
  • Mark G. E. Kelly, The Political Philosophy of Michel Foucault. New York: Routledge, 2009.
    • A comprehensive treatment of Foucault’s political thought from a specifically philosophical angle
  • John Rajchman, Michel Foucault: The Freedom of Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An idiosyncratic reading of Foucault that is particularly good at synthesising his entire career according to the political animus behind it.
  • Jon Simons, Foucault and the Political. London: Routledge, 1995.
    • The first work to focus on Foucault’s thought from a political introduction, this survey of his work serves well as a general introduction to the topic, though it necessarily lacks consideration of much that has appeared in English since its publication.
  • Barry Smart (ed.), Michel Foucault: Critical Assessments (multi-volume). London: Routledge, 1995.
    • Includes multiple sections on Foucault’s political thought.

Author Information

Mark Kelly
Middlesex University
United Kingdom