Quine, Willard Van Orman: Analytic/Synthetic Distinction

Willard Van Orman Quine: The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction

quine1Willard Van Orman Quine was one of the most well-known American “analytic” philosophers of the twentieth century. He made significant contributions to many areas of philosophy, including philosophy of language, logic, epistemology, philosophy of science, and philosophy of mind/psychology (behaviorism). However, he is best known for his rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction. Technically, this is the distinction between statements true in virtue of the meanings of their terms (like “a bachelor is an unmarried man”) and statements whose truth is a function not simply of the meanings of terms, but of the way the world is (such as, “That bachelor is wearing a grey suit”). Although a contentious thesis, analyticity has been a popular explanation, especially among empiricists, both for the necessity of necessary truths and for the a priori knowability of some truths. Thus, in some contexts “analytic truth,” “necessary truth,” and “a priori truth” have been used interchangeably, and the analytic/synthetic distinction has been treated as equivalent to the distinctions between necessary and contingent truths, and between a priori and a posteriori (or empirical) truths. Empirical truths can be known only by empirical verification, rather than by “unpacking” the meanings of the terms involved, and are usually thought to be contingent.

Quine wrestled with the analytic/synthetic distinction for years, but he did not make his thoughts public until 1950, when he delivered his paper, “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism” at a meeting of the American Philosophical Association. In this paper, Quine argues that all attempts to define and understand analyticity are circular. Therefore, the notion of analyticity should be rejected (along with, of course, the spurious distinction in which it features). This rejection has inspired debates and discussions for decades. For one thing, if Quine is right, and there are no truly necessary truths (that is, analytic truths), metaphysics, which traffics in such truths, is effectively dead.

Quine is generally classified as an analytic philosopher (where this sense of “analytic” has little to do with the analytic/synthetic distinction) because of the attention he pays to language and logic. He also employed a “naturalistic” method, which generally speaking, is an empirical, scientific method. A metaphysical approach was not an option for Quine, primarily because of his thoughts on analyticity.

Both because of the influence of “The Two Dogmas of Empircism” in analytic circles,  and because its perspective on analyticity is foundational to every other aspect of Quine’s thought—to his philosophies of language and logic, to his naturalistic epistemology, and to his anti-metaphysical stance—a survey of Quine’s thought on analyticity is perhaps the best introduction to his thought as a whole.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Influences
  2. The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction: A Focus on Analyticity
  3. Metaphysics: Some Implications
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Influences

Willard Van Orman Quine was born on June 25, 1908 in Akron Ohio. As a teenager, he was an avid stamp collector and a budding cartographer. One of his first publications was a free-hand map of the Portage Lakes of Ohio, which he sold for pennies to lakefront stores. When he was sixteen, Quine wrote the first edition of O.K. Stamp News, which was distributed to stamp collectors and dealers. Quine went on to write and distribute six more editions of the philatelic newspaper before moving on to new interests. One of these interests included active participation in the lighthearted “Greeter Club,” where members were required to call each other by their middle names (and engage in other sorts of playful word games). At this point, Quine became known as “Van” to his friends, a moniker that stuck with him for the rest of his life.

Quine received his undergraduate degree from OberlinCollege, in Oberlin, Ohio. He majored in mathematics with honors in mathematical philosophy and mathematical logic. During his college years, along with cultivating his interest in mathematics, mathematical logic, linguistics and philosophy, Quine began his secondary career as an intrepid traveler. He hitchhiked to, at least, Virginia, Kentucky, Canada and Michigan. In 1928, he made his way to Denver and back with a few friends, hopping freight trains, hitchhiking, and riding on running boards. Lodging often included jail houses (where one could sleep for free in relative safety), park benches and the ground. At the end of his junior year, he traveled to Europe. Quine writes in his autobiography, The Time of My Life: “An interest in foreign languages, like an interest in stamps, accorded with my taste for geography. Grammar, moreover, appeals to the same sense that is gratified by mathematics, or by the structure of boundaries and road networks” (Quine, 1987: 38).

During his junior year at Oberlin, Quine became immersed in Whitehead and Russell’s Principia Mathematica. Whitehead was a member of Harvard’s Philosophy Department, so Quine decided to apply to their doctoral program in philosophy. Graduating from Oberlin with an A- average, he was accepted, and received his Ph.D. in 2 years, at age twenty-three. Broadly speaking, his thesis sought to extensionalize the properties that populated the Principia. For our purposes, we may understand an extensional definition as a set of particular things. For instance, the extensional definition of a cat would consist of the set of all cats and the extensional definition of the property orange would consist of the set of all orange things (which could include things that are only partly orange). In Quine’s dissertation, we see his first concerted effort to do away with definitions that are not extensional, that is, with intensional definitions. Intensional definitions are, broadly speaking, generalizations, where particular things (for example, particular cats) are not employed in the definition. For instance, the intensional definition of a cat might be something like “four-legged feline mammal,” and likewise, the intensional definition of the property “orange” might be “a color that is the combination of yellow and red.” To some degree, Quine’s distaste for intensional definitions is rooted in Berkeley and Hume; also see the article on “the Classical theory of Concepts,” section 2 ). Generally speaking, Quine thought that intensional definitions, and likewise, “meanings” were vague, mentalistic entities; out of touch with the concrete particulars that comprise extensional definitions.

Quine’s use/mention distinction also first saw the light of day in his dissertation. This distinction underlines the difference between objects and names of objects. For instance, an actual cat, say Hercules the cat, is to be distinguished from the name ‘Hercules’. Quine uses single quotation marks to denote a name. Thus, Hercules the cat is orange and white, but the name ‘Hercules’ is not. Rather, the name ‘Hercules’ has other properties, for example, it begins with the letter ‘H’.  An actual object (for example, Hercules the cat) is mentioned, and we use a name (that is, ‘Hercules’) to do so.

After completing his dissertation in 1932, Quine was awarded a Sheldon Traveling Fellowship by Harvard. Taking the advice of Hebert Feigl and John Cooley, Quine, along with his first wife Naomi Clayton, set off for Europe to study with Rudolf Carnap. This would prove to be a momentous trip; Carnap had a singular and lasting influence on Quine. For although he initially agreed with much of what Carnap had to say, a number of Quine’s most distinctive ideas emerged as a result of rejecting some of Carnap’s more fundamental positions. Of particular importance is Quine’s rejection of the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements. Although the analytic/synthetic distinction had been a staple of the empiricist tradition since at least Hume, Quine was especially concerned with Carnap’s formulation of it.

2. The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction: A Focus on Analyticity

As Quine understood it (via Carnap), analytic truths are true as a result of their meaning. For instance, the statement “All bachelors are unmarried men” is true because being a “bachelor” means being an “unmarried man.” “Synthetic” claims on the other hand, are not true merely because of the meaning of the words used in the statement. Rather, the truth of these statements turns on facts. For instance, the claim “David is a bachelor” is only true if, in fact, David is a bachelor.

But before rejecting the analytic/synthetic distinction, Quine delivered three papers on Carnap to Harvard’s Society of Fellows in 1934, where he seemed to defend the distinction. They were titled: "The a priori," "Syntax," and "Philosophy as Syntax." Eager to get Carnap's work on the English-speaking philosophical stage, Quine delivered these lectures not only to give a clear and careful exposition of Carnap's new book, The Logical Syntax of Language, but to help convince the Harvard University that it needed Carnap (Carnap served as a visiting Professor at Harvard in 1940-41, but otherwise remained at the University of Chicago from 1936-1952.) Not only was Quine reading Carnap's work at this time, but Carnap was reading Quine's recent book, A System of Logistic, the published rewrite of his dissertation (Creath 1990: 149 – 160, # 15-17). Quine's respect for Carnap at this time is indisputable; a rapport had grown between the two such that they could easily exchange ideas and, for the most part, understand each other. Yet some sixty years after he gave the 1934 Harvard lectures, Quine confesses that they were rather servile reconstructions of Carnap’s thoughts, or as Quine puts it, they were "abjectly sequacious" (Quine, 1991: 266). For as early as 1933—a year before the Harvard lectures were delivered—Quine was having serious doubts about the analytic/synthetic distinction, doubts that he privately expressed to Carnap. For instance, on March 31, 1933, Carnap observes that "He [Quine] says after some reading of my "Syntax" MS [that is, the manuscript of Carnap’s The Logical Syntax of Language]: Is there a difference between logical axioms and empirical sentences? He thinks not. Perhaps I seek a distinction just for its utility, but it seems he is right: gradual difference: they are sentences we want to hold fast" (Quine, 1991:  267). Here, in the course of reading a draft of Carnap’s book in 1933, Quine questions the distinction between “logical axioms” and “empirical axioms,” where, generally speaking, “analytic” propositions entail logical axioms.

Almost twenty years later, Quine defended a variant of this position in his now famous paper, “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism.” Here, he claims that there is no sharp distinction between claims that are true in virtue of their meaning (analytic claims) and empirical claims (claims that may be verified by facts). In December 1950, Quine presented “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism” to the philosophers gathered at the annual meeting of the American Philosophical Association (APA). This marked his public rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction. But as we saw above, Quine had been brooding over the matter since at least 1933. Not only did his qualms about this distinction surface in his discussions and correspondence with Carnap but also in conversation with other prominent philosophers and logicians, for example, Alfred Tarski, Nelson Goodman, and Morton White (Quine, 1987: 226). Stimulated by these conversations, White wrote his often overlooked paper, “The Analytic and the Synthetic: An Untenable Dualism,” which was published before Quine presented the “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism” at the 1950 APA meeting (Quine footnotes this paper at the end of the published version “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism”).

Quine begins “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism” by defining an analytic proposition as one that is "true by virtue of meanings" (Quine, 1980: 21). The problem with this characterization, he explains, is that the nature of meanings is obscure; Quine reminds the reader of what he takes to be one of Carnap's biggest mistakes in semantics—meaning is not to be confused with naming. For instance, the clause “The Morning Star” has a different meaning than the clause “The Evening Star” but both name the same object (the planet Venus), and thus, both have the same reference. Similarly, Quine explains that one mustn't confuse the meaning, that is, the “intension,” of a general term with its extension, that is, the class of particular things to which the term applies. For instance, he points out, the two general terms "creature with a heart" and "creature with a kidney" both have the same extension because every creature with a heart has a kidney, and likewise. But these two statements clearly don't have the same meaning. Thus, for Quine there is a clear distinction between intensions and extensions, which reflects an equally clear distinction between meanings and references.

Quine then briefly explains the notion of what a word might mean, as opposed to what essential qualities an object denoted by that word might be said to have. For instance, the object man might be said to be essentially rational, while being, say, “two-legged” is an accidental property—there are plenty of humans who only have one leg, or who have no legs at all. As a result, the word ‘man’ must mean, at least “a rational being,” but it does not necessarily mean “two-legged.” Thus, Quine concludes, there seems to be some kind of parallel between the essential properties of an object and the meaning of the word that denotes that object. Or as Quine puts it: "meaning is what essence becomes when it is divorced from the object of reference and wedded to the word" (Quine, 1980: 22).

But does this imply that meanings are some kind of “objects?” This can’t be the case, Quine concludes, because he just showed that meanings must not be confused with objects, that is, meanings must not be confused with references (for example, we must not confuse the meaning of the phrase “morning star” with what the phrase names, that is, the object Venus). Instead, it seems we should focus on grasping what is happening when two words are “synonymous,” that is, what seems to be happening when two words are “analytically” related. For instance, the two words ‘bachelor’ and ‘unmarried’ seem to be synonymous, and thus, the proposition, “All bachelors are unmarried men” seems to be an analytic statement. And thus Quine writes: “The problem of analyticity confronts us anew” (Quine, 1980: 22).

To tackle the notion of analyticity, Quine makes a distinction between two kinds of analytic claims, those comprised of logical truths and those comprised of  synonymous terms. Logical truths, Quine explains, are any statements that remain true no matter how we interpret the non-logical particles in the statement. Logical particles are logical operators, for example, not, if then, or, all, no, some, and so forth. For instance, the statement “No not-X is X” will remain true no matter how we interpret X, for example, “No not-cat is a cat,” or “No not-bicycle is a bicycle.” An example of the second kind of analytic statement would be, Quine explains, “No bachelor is married,” where the meaning of the word ‘bachelor’ is synonymous with the meaning of the word ‘unmarried.’ However, we can make this kind of analytic claim into a logical truth (as defined above) by replacing ‘bachelor’ with its synonym, that is, ‘unmarried man,’ to get “No unmarried man is married,” which is an instance of No not-X is X. However, to make this substitution, we had to have some idea of what is meant by the word ‘synonymy,’ but this is problematical, so the notion of synonymy is the focus of the remainder of his discussion of analyticity.

Quine suggests that one might, as is often done, appeal to definitions to explain the notion of synonymy. For instance, we might say that  “bachelor” is the definition of an “unmarried man,”  and thus, synonymy turns on definitions. However, Quine attests, in order to define “bachelor” as unmarried, the definer must possess some notion of synonymy to begin with. In fact, Quine writes, the only kind of definition that does not presuppose the notion of synonymy, is the act of ascribing an abbreviation purely conventionally. For instance, let’s say that I create a new word, ‘Archon.’ I can arbitrarily say that its abbreviation is “Ba2.”   In the course of doing so, I did not have to presuppose that these two notions are “synonymous;” I merely abbreviated ‘Archon’ by convention, by stipulation. However, when I normally attempt to define a notion, for example, “bachelor,” I must think to myself something like, “Well, what does it mean to be a bachelor, particularly, what words have the same meaning as the word ‘bachelor?’” that is, what meanings are synonymous with the meaning of the word ‘bachelor?’ And thus, Quine complains: "would that all species of synonymy were as intelligible [as those created purely by convention]. For the rest, definition rests on synonymy rather than explaining it" (Quine, 1980: 26).

Perhaps then, Quine suggests, one could define synonymy in terms of "interchangability." Two words are synonymous if they are "[interchangeable] in all contexts without change of truth value" (Quine, 1980: 27)\. However, this is problematic as well. Consider, Quine explains, the sentence “’Bachelor’ has less than ten letters.” If we simply exchange the word ‘bachelor’ with the words ‘unmarried man’ we have created a false statement, that is, “‘Unmarried man’ has less than ten letters.”  We also have problems if we try to replace the word ‘bachelor’ with ‘unmarried man’ in phrases like ‘bachelor of arts,’ or ‘bachelor’s buttons.’ But, Quine explains, we can get around the latter problem if we say that ‘bachelor of arts’ is a complete word, and thus, the ‘bachelor’ part of this word is merely a word-fragment, which cannot be interchanged with a complete word, for example, ‘bachelor’ when not understood as part of a phrase.

Regardless of this quick fix, what we are really after is “cognitive synonymy,” which is to be distinguished from the word-play discussed above. However, Quine is not quite sure what cognitive synonymy entails. But, he reminds us, we do know that “the sort of synonymy needed … [is] merely such that any analytic statement [can] be turned into a logical truth by putting synonyms for synonyms.” (Quine, 1980: 22). Recall, for instance, our example regarding “No not-X is an X.” In this case, we saw that  for example, “No bachelor is married” is in fact, an instance of the logical truth, No not-X is an X, particularly, “No unmarried man is a married man,” if, in fact, the words ‘bachelor’ and ‘unmarried man’ are synonymous. Thus, what we are looking for is this kind of synonymy; this is “cognitive synonymy.” However, in order to explain “cognitive synonymy”—as we just did—we had to assume that we knew what analyticity meant. In particular, we had to assume the meanings of the two kinds of analyticity explained above, that is, analyticity qua logical axioms and analyticity qua synonymy. And thus, Quine writes: “What we need is an account of cognitive synonymy not presupposing analyticity.” (Quine, 1980: 29). So, the question is, can we give an account of cognitive synonymy by appealing to interchangeability (recall that this is the task at hand) without presupposing any definition of analyticity?

Yes, initially it seems that one could, if our language contained the word “necessarily.” However, it turns out that the kind of “necessary” we have to assume may only apply to analytic statements, and thus, we once again presuppose a notion of analyticity to explain cognitive synonymy. Generally speaking, this plays out as follows: Assume that (1) “Necessarily all and only bachelors are bachelors.” (Quine, 1980: 29). That is, the word ‘necessary’ implies that this claim is logically true, and thus, it is analytic. Thus, if we assume that the words ‘bachelor’ and ‘unmarried man’ are interchangeable (in regard to meaning, not letters), then (2) “Necessarily all and only bachelors are unmarried men” is true, where once, again, the word ‘necessary’ seems to make this logically, that is, analytically true. And thus, once again, we needed to presuppose a notion of analyticity to define cognitive synonymy; “To suppose that [‘necessary’ makes sense] is to suppose that we have already made satisfactory sense of ‘analytic’” (Quine, 1980: 30).

Quine’s final proposal to define analyticity without an appeal to meaning—and thus without appeal to synonymy or definitions as follows: We can try to assimilate a natural language to a formal language by appealing to the semantical rules developed by Carnap (see the article on Rudolf Carnap, sections 3-6). However, Quine finds the same kind of circularity here that he has found elsewhere. To show why, Quine reconstructs a general Carnapian paradigm regarding artificial languages and semantical rules, that, broadly speaking, proceeds as follows:

[1] Assume there is an artificial language L0. Its semantical rules explicitly specify which statements are analytic in L0.

[2] A problem immediately surfaces: To extensionally define what is analytic in L0, the intensional  meaning of 'analytic' is presupposed in the rules, simply because “the rules contain the word ‘analytic’ which we don’t understand!” (Quine, 1980: 33) Although we have an extensional definition of 'analytic,’ we do not have an intensional definition, that is, we do not understand what analyticity means, regardless if we have a list of particular expressions that are allegedly analytic. For instance, if I asked you to compile a list of things that are “smargon,” and you did, but you had no idea what the word ‘smargon’ means, you’d be in trouble—how could you even compile your list without knowing what ‘smargon’ means?

[3] Perhaps though, one could understand the term 'analytic for L0' simply as a convention, calling it 'K' so it looks like the intensional meaning of the word  'analytic—' that is, a well-defined intensional account of analytic—is not at work anywhere. But, Quine asks, why the specific class K, and not some other arbitrary class, for example, L-Z? (Quine, 1980: 33) For instance, let’s say that I wanted to arbitrarily give a list of all things that are smargon, but I don’t know what the word ‘smargon’ means. So I create a list of things that just so happen to be green. But why did I pick just green things? Why not orange things, or things that had no particular color at all?

[4] Let it be supposed instead then, that there is a kind of semantical rule that does not specify which statements are analytic, but simply those that are true. But not all truths, just a certain set of truths. Thus, one may then define “analytic truths” as those that belong to this set. And so, "A statement is analytic if it is (not merely true but) true according to the semantical rule" (Quine, 1980: 34). However (generally speaking), the same problem surfaces in terms of "semantical rule—" how does it specify which statements are to be included in the class of truths without in some sense presupposing the intensional meaning of the word 'analytic?' The circle is pervasive, and so: “we might just stop tugging at our bootstraps altogether” (Quine, 1980: 36).

And thus, in 1950, Quine is confident that, perhaps once and for all, after nearly twenty years of intermittent discussion of the matter with Carnap and others, he should reject the notion of “analyticity.”

3. Metaphysics: Some Implications

Quine’s rejection of analyticity has many implications, particularly for the field of metaphysics. According to the main camp of metaphysicians, metaphysics, generally speaking, employs a method where deductive logical laws are applied to a set of axioms that are necessarily true. The propositions produced by such a method are, as a result, necessarily true as well (think, for instance of Descartes’ method /descarte/#H3 or Leibniz’s). For the most part, these truths, the axioms that they are derived from, and the logical laws that are used to derive them, are thought to reflect the necessary and eternal nature of the universe.

However, if there are, as Quine claims, no such things as necessary truths, that is, analytic truths, then this main camp of metaphysics is essentially eviscerated. It is, at best, a field where clever people play still cleverer games, manipulating allegedly “necessary” truths with allegedly “necessary” laws. This attack on metaphysics by Quine has spawned new camps of metaphysics which do not rely in this way on deductive methods.

What method then, did Quine use? The empirical method. In this respect, Quine was a scientific philosopher, that is, what is often called a naturalistic philosopher.  Like Hume, he believed that philosophical conclusions were not necessarily true—they did not reflect or capture the essential nature of humanity, let alone the nature of the universe. Rather, they were testable, and potentially could be rejected.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Carnap, R. The Logical Structure of the World; Psuedo problems in Philosophy, Second Edition. Translated by R.A. George, Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1967 [Original publication date 1928]
  • Carnap, R. The Logical Syntax of Language. Translated by A. Smeaton. London: Routledge, 1959.
  • Carnap, R. Meaning and Necessity. Second edition with supplements. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1947.
  • Creath, R. Dear Carnap, Dear Van: The Quine-Carnap Correspondence and Related Work. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1990.
  • Davidson, D. and Hintikka, J. eds. Words and Objections, Essays on the Work of W.V. Quine. Synthese Library 21. Revised ed. Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publishing Company, 1969.
  • Dreben, Burton. “In Medius Rebus.” Inquiry, 37 (1995): pp. 441-7.
  • Dreben, Burton. “Putnam, Quine—and the Facts.” Philosophical Topics, 20 (1992): pp. 293-315.
  • Fara, R. Director: “In Conversation: W.V. Quine.” A Philosophy International Production, London: Philosophy International, London School of Economics, 1994: tapes 1-8.
  • Fogelin, R. “Aspects of Quine’s Naturalized Epistemology.” The Cambridge Companion to Quine, ed. R.F. Gibson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004
  • Gibson, R.F., ed., The Cambridge Companion to Quine, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004
  • Hintikka, J. “Three Dogmas of Quine’s Empiricism,” Revue Internationale de Philosophie 51 (1997): pp. 457-477
  • Hookway, C. Quine: Language, Experience and Reality. Cambridge: Polity Press, 1988.
  • Leonardi, P. and Santambrogio, M. On Quine, New Essays. Oxford: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Pakaluk, M. “Quine’s 1946 Lectures on Hume.” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 27 (1989): pp. 445-459
  • Quine, W.V. A System of Logistic, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1934.
  • Quine, W.V. “Carnap” Yale Review 76 (1987): pp. 226-230.
  • Quine, W.V. From Stimulus to Science, Cambridge, MA: Harvard, 1995.
  • Quine, W.V. “In Praise of Observation Sentences.” Journal of Philosophy, XC, #3 (1993): pp. 107-116.
  • Quine, W.V. Methods of Logic, fourth edition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1982 [Original edition, 1950].
  • Quine, W.V. “On Empirically Equivalent Systems of the World.” Erkenntnis 9, 3 (1975): 313-28.
  • Quine, W.V. "On Philosophers' Concern with Language." (editor's title: "Words are all we have to go on"), Times Literary Supplement. July 3, 1992: 8
  • Quine, W.V. Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. New York: Columbia, 1969.
  • Quine, W.V. Pursuit of Truth. Revised ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard, 1992
  • Quine, W.V. Quiddities: An Intermittently Philosophical Dictionary. Cambridge, MA: Harvard, 1987.
  • Quine, W.V. “Review of Carnap,” Philosophical Review, 44 (1935): pp. 394-7.
  • Quine, W.V. The Roots of Reference, La Salle: Illinois: Open Court, 1974.
  • Quine, W.V. “States of Mind.” Journal of Philosophy 82 (1985) pp. 5-8.
  • Quine, W.V. The Time of My Life: An Autobiography, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1987.
  • Quine, W.V. Theories and Things. Cambridge, MA: Harvard, 1981
  • Quine, W.V. “Two Dogmas in Retrospect,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 21 #3 (1991): pp. 265-274
  • Quine, W.V. “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism” in From a Logical Point of View: 9 logico-philosophical essays. 2nd ed., revised. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1980 [Original publication date: 1953]
  • Quine, W.V. “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism,” The Philosophical Review 60 (1951): 20-43.
  • Quine, W.V. The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays. Enlarged edition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard, 1976.
  • Quine, W.V. Word and Object. Cambridge, MA: MIT, 1960..
  • Richardson, A.W. Carnap’s Construction of the World: The Aufbau and the Emergence of Logical Empiricism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998,
  • Rocknak, S. “Understanding Quine in Terms of the Aufbau: Another Look at Naturalized Epistemology” in Beyond Description: Naturalism and Normativity, eds. Marcin Milkowski and Konrad Talmud-Kaminski, Texts in Philosophy (College Publications, 2010, Vol. 13, pp. 195-210).
  • Romanos, G.P. Quine and Analytic Philosophy. Cambridge: MIT Press, 1983.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Our Knowledge of the External World. London: George Allen and Unwin Ltd., 1961.
  • Schilpp, P.A. ed, The Philosophy of Rudolph Carnap: Library of Living Philosophers, II. La Salles, Illinois: Open Court, 1963
  • Schilpp, P.A. and Edwin L., eds. The Philosophy of W.V. Quine: Library of Living Philosophers, XVII, La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1986.
  • Schilpp, P.A. and Edwin L., eds. The Philosophy of W.V. Quine: Library of Living Philosophers, XVII, Expanded Edition, La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1998.
  • Shahan, R.W. and Swoyer, C. eds. Essays on the Philosophy of W.V. Quine, Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1979
  • Tooke, J.H., The Divisions of Purley, vol. 1, London, 1786, Boston, 1806.
  • White, M. “The Analytic and the Synthetic: An Untenable Dualism,” John Dewey: Philosopher of Science and Freedom, ed. S. Hook. New York: Dial, 1950.
  • Whitehead, A.N. and Bertrand Russell. Principia Mathematica, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1910.

 

Author Information

Stefanie Rocknak
Email: rocknaks@hartwick.edu
Hartwick College
U. S. A.

Dreaming, Philosophy of

Philosophy of Dreaming

According to Owen Flanagan (2000), there are four major philosophical questions about dreaming:

1. How can I be sure I am not always dreaming?

2. Can I be immoral in dreams?

3. Are dreams conscious experiences that occur during sleep?

4. Does dreaming have an evolutionary function?

These interrelated questions cover philosophical domains as diverse as metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, scientific methodology, and the philosophy of biology, mind and language. This article covers the four questions and also looks at some newly emerging philosophical questions about dreams:

5. Is dreaming an ideal scientific model for consciousness research?

6. Is dreaming an instance of hallucinating or imagining?

Section 1 introduces the traditional philosophical question that Descartes asked himself, a question which has championed scepticism about the external world. How can I be sure I am not always dreaming, or dreaming right now? Philosophers have typically looked for features that distinguish dreams from waking life and one key debate centres on whether it is possible to feel pain in a dream.

Section 2 surveys the ethics of dreaming. The classical view of Augustine is contrasted with more abstract ethical positions, namely, those of the Deontologist, the Consequentialist and the Virtue Ethicist. The notion of lucid dreaming is examined here in light of the question of responsibility during dreaming and how we treat other dream characters.

Sections 3 covers the various different positions, objections and replies to question 3: the debate about whether dreaming is, or is not, a conscious state. The challenges from Malcolm and Dennett are covered. These challenges question the authority of the common-sense view of dreaming as a consciously experienced state. Malcolm argues that the concept of dreaming is incoherent, while Dennett puts forward a theory of dreaming without appealing to consciousness.

Section 4 covers the evolutionary debate, where empirical work ultimately leaves us uncertain of the extent to which natural selection has shaped dreaming, if at all. Early approaches by Freud and Jung are reviewed, followed by approaches by Flanagan and Revonsuo. Though Freud, Jung and Revonsuo have argued that dreaming is functional, Flanagan represents a view shared by many neuroscientists that dreaming has no function at all.

Section 5 looks at questions 5 and 6. Question 5 is about the cutting edge issue of precisely how dreaming should be integrated into the research program of consciousness. Should dreaming be taken as a scientific model of consciousness? Might dreaming play another role such as a contrast analysis with other mental states? Question 6, which raises a question of the exact qualitative nature of dreaming, has a longer history, though it is also receiving contemporary attention. The section outlines reasons favouring the orthodox view of psychology, that dream imagery is perceptual (hallucinatory), and reasons favouring the philosophical challenge to that orthodoxy, that dreams are ultimately imaginative in nature.

Table of Contents

  1. Dreaming in Epistemology
    1. Descartes’ Dream Argument
    2. Objections and Replies
  2. The Ethics of Dreaming
    1. Saint Augustine on the Morality of Dreaming
    2. Consequentialist vs. Deontological Positions on Dreaming
    3. Virtue Ethics of Dreaming
  3. Are Dreams Consciously Experienced?
    1. The Received View of Dreaming
    2. Malcolm’s Challenge to the Received View
      1. The Impossibility of Verifying Dream Reports
      2. The Conflicting Definitions of “Sleep” and “Dreaming”
      3. The Impossibility of Communicating or Making Judgments during Sleep
      4. Ramifications (contra Descartes)
    3. Possible Objections to Malcolm
      1. Putnam on the Conceptual Analysis of Dreaming
      2. Distinguishing “State” and “Creature” Consciousness
    4. Dennett’s Challenge to the Received View
      1. A New Model of Dreaming: Uploading Unconscious Content
      2. Accounting for New Data on Dreams: “Precognitive” Dreams
    5. Possible Objections to Dennett
      1. Lucid Dreaming
      2. Alternative Explanations for “Precognitive” Dreams
  4. The Function of Dreaming
    1. Early Approaches
      1. Freud: Psychoanalysis
      2. Jung: Analytic Psychology
    2. Contemporary Approaches
      1. Pluralism
      2. Adaptationism
  5. Dreaming in Contemporary Philosophy of Mind and Consciousness
    1. Should Dreaming Be a Scientific Model?
      1. Dreaming as a Model of Consciousness
      2. Dreaming as a Contrast Case for Waking Consciousness
    2. Is Dreaming an Instance of Images or Percepts?
      1. Dreaming as Hallucination
      2. Dreaming as Imagination
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Dreaming in Epistemology

a. Descartes’ Dream Argument

Descartes strove for certainty in the beliefs we hold. In his Meditations on First Philosophy he wanted to find out what we can believe with certainty and thereby claim as knowledge. He begins by stating that he is certain of being seated by the fire in front of him. He then dismisses the idea that this belief could be certain because he has been deceived before in dreams where he has similarly been convinced that he was seated by a fire, only to wake and discover that he was only dreaming that he was seated by a fire. How can I know that I am not now dreaming? is the resulting famous question Descartes asked himself. Though Descartes was not the first to ask himself this question (see Zhuangzi’s eponymous work, Plato’s Theaetetus and Aristotle’s Metaphysics) he was the first philosopher to doggedly pursue and try to answer the question. In answering the question, due to the sensory deception of dreams, Descartes believes that we cannot trust our senses in waking life (without invoking a benevolent God who would surely not deceive us).

The phenomenon of dreaming is used as key evidence for the sceptical hypothesis that everything we currently believe to be true could be false and generated by a dream. Descartes holds the common-sense view that dreams, which regularly occur in all people, are a sequence of experiences often similar to those we have in waking life (this has come to be labelled as the “received view” of dreaming). A dream makes it feel as though the dreamer is carrying out actions in waking life, for during a dream we do not realize that it is a dream we are experiencing. Descartes claims that the experience of a dream could in principle be indistinguishable from waking life – whatever apparent subjective differences there are between waking life and dreaming, they are insufficient differences to gain certainty that I am not now dreaming. Descartes is left unsure that the objects in front of him are real – whether he is dreaming of their existence or whether they really are there. Dreaming was the first source for motivating Descartes’ method of doubt which came to threaten perceptual and introspective knowledge. In this method, he would use any means to subject a statement or allegedly true belief to the most critical scrutiny.

Descartes’ dream argument began with the claim that dreams and waking life can have the same content. There is, Descartes alleges, a sufficient similarity between the two experiences for dreamers to be routinely deceived into believing that they are having waking experiences while we are actually asleep and dreaming.  The dream argument has similarities to his later evil demon argument. According to this later argument, I cannot be sure anything I believe for I may just be being deceived by a malevolent demon. Both arguments have the same structure: nothing can rule out my being duped into believing I am having experience X, when I am really in state Y, hence I cannot have knowledge Z, about my current state. Even if the individuals happen to be right in their belief that they are not being deceived by an evil demon and even if individuals really are having a waking life experience, they are left unable to distinguish reality from their dream experiences in order to gain certainty in their belief that they are not now dreaming.

b. Objections and Replies

Since the Meditations on First Philosophy was published, Descartes’ argument has been replied to. One main claim that has been replied to is the idea that there are no certain marks to distinguish waking consciousness from dreaming. Hobbes believed that an absence of the absurd in waking life was a key difference (Hobbes, 1651: Part 1, Chapter 2). Though sleeping individuals are too wrapped up in the absurdity of their dreams to be able to distinguish their states, an individual who is awake can tell, simply because the absurdity is no longer there during wakefulness. Locke compared real pain to dream pain. He asks Descartes to consider the difference between dreaming of being in the fire and actually being in the fire (Locke, 1690: Book 4, Chapter 2, § 2). Locke’s claim is that we cannot have physical pain in dreams as we do in waking life. His claim, if true, undermines Descartes’ premise that there are no certain marks to distinguish dreaming from waking life such that we could ever be sure we are in one or the other states.

Descartes thought that dreams are protean (Hill, 2004b). By “protean”, Hill means that dream experience can replicate the panoply of any possible waking life experience; to put it negatively, there is no experience in waking life that could not be realistically simulated (and thereby be phenomenally indistinguishable) in dreams. This protean claim was necessary for Descartes to mount his sceptical argument about the external world. After all, if there was even one experience during waking life which simply could not occur during dreaming, then, in that moment at least, we could be sure we are awake and in contact with the external world, rather than dreaming. Locke alleged that he had found a gap in this protean claim: we do not and cannot feel pain in dreams. The notion of pain occurring in a dream has now been put to the test in a number of scientific studies through quantitative analysis of the content of dream diaries in the case of ordinary dreams and also by participating lucid dreamers. The conclusion reached independently by these various studies is that the occurrence of sharply localized pains can occur in dreams, though they are rare (Zadra, and others 1998; LaBerge & DeGracia, 2000). According to the empirical work then, Locke is wrong about his claim, though he might still query whether really agonizing and ongoing pain (as in his original request of being in a fire) might not be possible in dreams. The empirical work supports Descartes’ conviction that dreams can recapitulate any waking state, meaning that there is no essential difference between waking and dreaming thereby ruling out certainty that this is not now a dream.

Another common attempt to distinguish waking life from dreaming is the “principle of coherence” (Malcolm, 1959: Chapter 17). We are awake and not asleep dreaming if we can connect our current experiences to the overall course of our lives. Essentially, through using the principle of coherence, we can think more critically in waking life. Hobbes seems to adhere to something like the principle of coherence in his appeal to absurdity as a key feature of dreams. Though dreams do have a tendency to involve a lack of critical thinking, it still seems possible that we could wake with a dream connecting to the overall course of our lives. It is generally accepted that there is no certain way to distinguish dreaming from waking life, though the claim that this ought to undermine our knowledge in any way is controversial.

For an alternative response to Descartes’ sceptical dream argument see Sosa (2007), who says that “in dreaming we do not really believe; we only make-believe.” He argues that in dreaming we actually only ever imagine scenarios, which never involve deceptive beliefs, and so we have no reason to feel our ordinary waking life beliefs can be undermined. Descartes relied on a notion of belief that was the same in both dreaming and waking life. Of course, if I have never believed, in sleep, that I was seated by the fire when I was actually asleep in bed, then none of my dreams challenge the perceptual and introspective beliefs I have during waking life. Ichikawa (2008) agrees with Sosa that in dreams we imagine scenarios (rather than believe we are engaged in scenarios as though awake), but he argues in contrast to Sosa, that this does not avoid scepticism about the external world. Even when dreams trade in imaginings rather than beliefs, the dreams still create subjectively indistinguishable experiences from waking experience. Due to the similarity in experience, it would be “epistemically irresponsible” to believe that we are engaged in waking experiences when we think we are on the sole basis that we imagine our dream experiences and imaginings are not beliefs. I still cannot really tell the difference between the experiences. The new worry is whether the belief I have in waking life is really a belief, rather than an imagining during dreaming and so scepticism is not avoided, so Ichikawa claims.

2. The Ethics of Dreaming

Since the late twentieth century, discussion of the moral and criminal responsibility of dreaming has been centred on sleep walking, where sleep-walkers have harmed others. The assessment has typically been carried out in practical, rather than theoretical, settings, for example law courts. Setting aside the notion of sleepwalking, philosophers are more concerned with the phenomenology of ordinary dreams. Does the notion of right and wrong apply to dreams themselves, as well as actions done by sleepwalkers?

a. Saint Augustine on the Morality of Dreaming

Saint Augustine, seeking to live a morally perfect life, was worried about some of the actions he carried out in dreams. For somebody who devoted his life to celibacy, his sexual dreams of fornication worried him. In his Confessions (Book X; Chapter 30), he writes to God. He talks of his success in quelling sexual thoughts and earlier habits from his life before his religious conversion. But he declares that in dreams he seems to have little control over committing the acts that he avoids during the waking day. He rhetorically asks “am I not myself during sleep?” believing that it really is him who is the central character of his dreams. In trying to solve the problem Augustine appeals to the apparent experiential difference between waking and dreaming life. He draws a crucial distinction between “happenings” and “actions.” Dreams fall into the former category. Augustine was not carrying out actions but was rather undergoing an experience which happened to him without choice on his part. By effectively removing agency from dreaming, we cannot be responsible for what happens in our dreams. As a result, the notion of sin or moral responsibility cannot be applied to our dreams (Flanagan, 2000: p.18; pp. 179 - 183). According to Augustine, only actions are morally evaluable. He is committed to the claim that all events that occur in dreams are non-actions. The claim that actions do not occur during sleep is brought into question by lucid dreams which seem to involve genuine actions and decision making processes whereby dreaming individuals can control, affect and alter the course of the dream. The success of Augustine’s argument hinges on there being no actions in dreams. Lucid dreaming is therefore evidence against this premise. We have now seen Augustine’s argument that moral notions never apply to dreams fail (because they can involve actions rather than happenings). In the next section we will see what the two main ethical positions might say on the issue of right and wrong in dreams.

b. Consequentialist vs. Deontological Positions on Dreaming

Dreaming is an instance of a more general concern about a subset of thoughts – fantasies – that occur, potentially without affecting behaviour We seem to carry out actions during dreams in simulated realities involving other characters. So perhaps we ought to consider whether we are morally responsible for actions in dreams. More generally, are we morally obliged to not entertain certain thoughts, even if these thoughts do not affect our later actions and do not harm others? The same issue might be pressed with the use of violent video games, though the link to later behaviour is more controversial. Some people enjoy playing violent video games and the more graphic the better. Is that unethical in and of itself? Why should we excuse people’s thoughts – when, if they were carried out as actual actions they would be grossly wrong? Dreaming is perhaps a special instance because in ordinary dreams we believe we are carrying out actions in real life. What might the two main moral theories say about the issue, with the assumption in place that what we do in dreams does not affect our behaviour in waking life?

Consequentialism is a broad family of ethical doctrines which always assesses an action in terms of the consequences it has. There are two separate issues – ethical and empirical. The empirical question asks whether dreams, fantasies and video games are really without behavioural consequence towards others. To be clear, the Consequentialist is not arguing that dreams do not have any consequences, only that if they really do have no consequences then they are not morally evaluable or should be deemed neutral. Consequentialist theories may well argue that, provided that dreams really do not affect my behaviour later, it is not morally wrong to “harm” other dream characters, even in lucid dreaming. The more liberal Consequentialists might even see value in these instances of free thought. That is, there might be some intrinsic good in allowing such freedom of the mind but this is not a value that can be outweighed by actual harm to others, so the Consequentialists might claim. If having such lucid dreams makes me nicer to people in waking life, then the Consequentialist will actually endorse such activity during sleep.

Consequentialists will grant their argument even though dream content has an intentional relation to other people. Namely, dreams can often have singular content. Singular content, or singular thought, is to be contrasted with general content (the notion of singular thought is somewhat complex. Readers should consult Jeshion, 2010). If I simply form a mental representation of a blond Hollywood actor, the features of the representation might be too vague to pick out any particular individual. My representation could equally be fulfilled by Brad Pitt, Steve McQueen, a fictional movie star or countless other individuals. If I deliberately think of Brad Pitt, or if the images come to me detailed enough, then my thought does not have general content but is about that particular individual. Dreams are not always about people with general features (though they can be), but are rather often about people the sleeping individual is actually acquainted with – particular people from that individual’s own life – family, friends, and so forth.

Deontological theories, in stark contrast to Consequential theories, believe that we have obligations to act and think, or not act and think, in certain ways regardless of effects on other people. According to Deontological moral theories, I have a duty to never entertain certain thoughts because it is wrong in itself. Deontological theories see individuals as more important than mere consequences of action. Individuals are “ends-in-themselves” and not the means to a desirable state of affairs. Since dreams are often actually about real people, I am not treating that individual as an end-in-itself if I chose to harm their “dream representative”. The basic Deontological maxim to treat someone as an end rather than a means to my entertainment can apply to dreams.

As the debate between Deontologists and Consequentialists plays out, nuanced positions will reveal themselves. Perhaps there is room for agreement between the Consequentialist and Deontologist. Maybe I can carry out otherwise immoral acts on dream characters with general features where these characters do not represent any particular individuals of the waking world. Some Deontologists might still be unhappy with the notion that in dreams one crucial element of singular content remains – we represent ourselves in dreams. The arch-Deontologist Kant will argue that one is not treating oneself as an end-in-itself but a means to other ends by carrying out the acts; namely, there is something inherently wrong about even pretending to carry out an immoral action because in doing so we depersonalize ourselves. Other Deontologists might want to speak about fantasies being different from dreams. Fantasies are actions, where I sit down and decide to indulge my daydreams, whereas dreams might be more passive and therefore might respect the Augustinian distinction between actions and happenings. On this view, I am not using someone as a means to an end if I am just passively dreaming whereas I am if I start actively thinking about that individual. So maybe the Deontologist case only applies to lucid dreaming, where Augustine’s distinction would still be at work. This might exempt a large number of dreams from being wicked, but not all of them.

c. Virtue Ethics of Dreaming

Deontology and Consequentialism are the two main moral positions. The third is Virtue Ethics, which emphasizes the role of character. This moral approach involves going beyond actions of right and wrong, avoiding harm and maximizing pleasure, and instead considers an individual for his or her overall life, how to make it a good one and develop that individual’s character. Where might dreaming fit in with the third moral position – that of the Virtue Ethicist? Virtue Ethics takes the question “what is the right action?” and turns it into the broader question: “how should I live?” The question “can we have immoral dreams?” needs to be opened up to: “what can I get out of dreaming to help me acquire virtuousness?”

The Virtue Ethics of dreaming might be pursued in a Freudian or Jungian vein. Dreams arguably put us in touch with our unconscious and indirectly tell us about our motives and habits in life:

“[I]t is in the world of dreaming that the unconscious is working out its powerful dynamics. It is there that the great forces do battle or combine to produce the attitudes, ideals, beliefs, and compulsions that motivate most of our behavior Once we become sensitive to dreams, we discover that every dynamic in a dream is manifesting itself in some way in our practical lives—in our actions, relationships, decisions, automatic routines, urges, and feelings.” (Johnson, 2009: p.19)

Similarly:

“Studying our own dreams can be valuable in all sorts of ways. They can be reveal our inner motivations and hopes, help us face our fears, encourage growing awareness and even be a source of creativity and insight.” (Blackmore, 2004: p.338)

In order to achieve happiness, fulfilment and developing virtuousness we owe it to ourselves to recall and pay attention to our dreams. However, this line of argument relies on the claim that dreams really do function in a way that Freud or Jung thought they do, which is controversial: dream analysis of any kind lacks scientific status and is more of an art. But then social dynamics and the development of character is more of an art than a science. Virtue Ethics is perhaps the opposite side of the coin of psychotherapy. The former focuses on positive improvement of character, whereas the latter focuses on avoiding negative setbacks in mind and behaviour Whether psychotherapy should be used more for positive improvement of character is a question approached in the philosophy of medicine. These considerations touch on a further question of whether dreams should be used in therapy.

Certain changes people make in waking life do eventually “show up” in dreams. Dreams, as unconsciously instantiated, capture patterns of thought from waking life. New modes of thinking can be introduced and this is the process by which people learn to lucid dream. By periodically introducing thoughts about whether one is awake or not during the day, every day for some period of time, this pattern of thinking eventually occurs in dreams. By constantly asking “am I awake?” in the day it becomes more likely to ask oneself in a dream, to realize that one is not awake and answer in the negative (Blackmore, 1991). With the possibility that dreams do capture waking life thinking and the notion that one can learn to lucid dream one may ask whether Augustine tried his hardest at stopping the dreams that troubled him and whether he was really as successful at quelling sexual urges in waking life as he thought he was.

Ordinary dreams are commonly thought to not actually involve choices and corresponding agency. Lucid dreaming invokes our ability to make choices, often to the same extent as in waking life. Lucid dreaming represents an example of being able to live and act in a virtual reality and is especially timely due to the rise in number of lucid dreamers (popular manuals on how to lucid dream are sold and actively endorsed by some leading psychologists; see LaBerge & Rheingold, 1990; Love, 2013) and the increase of virtual realities on computers. Whereas Deontologists and Consequentialists are likely to be more interested in the content of the dreams, the Virtue Ethicist will likely be more interested in dreaming as an overall activity and how it fits in with one’s life. Stephen LaBerge is perhaps an implicit Virtue Ethicist of dreaming. Though humans are thought to be moral agents, we spend a third of our lives asleep. 11% of our mental experiences are dreams (Love, 2013: p.2). The dreams we experience during sleep are mostly non-agentic and this amounts to a significant unfulfilled portion of our lives. LaBerge argues that by not cultivating lucid dreams, we miss out on opportunities to explore our own minds and ultimately enrich our waking lives (LaBerge & Rheingold, 1990: p.9). Arguably then, the fulfilled virtuous person will try to develop the skill of lucid dreaming. One could object that the dreamer should just get on with life in the real world. After all, learning to lucid dream for most people takes time and practice, requiring the individual to think about their dreams for periods of time in their waking life. They could be spending their time instead doing voluntary work for charity in real life. In reply, the Virtue Ethicist can show how parallel arguments can be made for meditation: individuals are calmer in situations that threaten their morality and are working on longer-term habits. Similarly, the lucid dreamer is achieving fulfilment and nurturing important long term traits and habits. By gaining control of dreams, there is the opportunity to examine relationships with people by representing them in dreams. Lucid dreams might aid in getting an individual to carry out a difficult task in real life by allowing them to practice it in life-like settings (that go beyond merely imagining the scenario in waking life). Lucid dreams may then help to play a role in developing traits that people otherwise would not develop, and act as an outlet for encouraging the “thick moral concepts” of oneself – courage, bravery, wisdom, and so forth. Lucid dreaming helps in developing such traits and so can be seen as a means to the end of virtuousness or act as a supplementary virtue. Human experience can be taken as any area in which a choice is required. At the very least then, lucid dreaming signifies an expansion of agency.

3. Are Dreams Consciously Experienced?

a. The Received View of Dreaming

There is an implicit, unquestioned commitment in both Descartes’ dream argument and Augustine’s argument on the morality of dreaming. This is the received view, which is the platitudinous claim that a dream is a sequence of experiences that occur during sleep. The received view typically adheres to a number of further claims: that dreams play out approximately in real time and do not happen in a flash. When a dream is successfully remembered, the content of the dream is to a large extent what is remembered after waking (see Fig. 1 below), and an individual’s dream report is taken as excellent evidence for that dream having taken place.

Fig 1

 

The received view is committed to the claim that we do not wake up with misleading memories. Any failure of memory is of omission rather than error. I might wake unable to recall the exact details of certain parts of a dream, but I will not wake up and believe I had a dream involving contents which did not occur (I might recall details A – G with D missing, but I will not wake and recall content X, Y, Z). The received view is not committed to a claim about exactly how long a dream takes to experience, in correlation to how long it takes to remember, but dreams cannot occur instantaneously during sleep. The received view is committed to the claim that dreams are extended in time during sleep. The content does not necessarily have to occur just before waking; another graph detailing possible experience and later recollection of dream content on the received view might show A – G occurring much earlier in sleep (with the recalled A* - G* in the same place). A – G can represent any dream that people ordinarily recall

We can appear to carry out a scope of actions in our dreams pretty similar to those of waking life. Everything that we can do in waking life, we can also do in dreams. The exact same mental states can occur in dreams just as they do in waking life. We can believe, judge, reason and converse with what we take to be other individuals in our dreams. Since we can be frightened in a dream we can be frightened during sleep.

The received view is attested by reports of dreams from ordinary people in laboratory and everyday settings. Every dreamer portrays the dream as a mental experience that occurred during sleep. The received view is hence a part of folk psychology which is the term given to denote the beliefs that ordinary people hold on matters concerning psychology such as the nature of mental states. When it comes to dreaming, the consensus (folk psychology, scientific psychology and philosophy) agree that dreams are experiences that occur during sleep.

b. Malcolm’s Challenge to the Received View

Malcolm stands in opposition to received view – the implicit set of claims about dreams that Descartes, Augustine and the majority of philosophers, psychologists and ordinary people are committed to. It will be worth separating Malcolm’s challenge to the received view into three arguments: #1 dream reports are unverifiable; #2 sleep and dreaming have conflicting definitions; #3 communication and judgements cannot occur during sleep.

i. The Impossibility of Verifying Dream Reports

According to Malcolm’s first argument, we should not simply take dream reports at face value, as the received view has done; dream reports are insufficient to believe the metaphysical claim that dreaming consciously takes place during sleep. When we use introspection after sleeping to examine our episodic memories of dreams and put our dream report into words, these are not the dream experiences themselves. Malcolm adds that there is no other way to check the received view’s primary claim that dreams are consciously experienced during sleep. Importantly, Malcolm states that the sole criterion we have for establishing that one has had a dream is that one awakes with the impression of having dreamt (that is, an apparent memory) and that one then goes on to report the dream. Waking with the impression does not entail that there was a conscious experience during sleep that actually corresponds to the report. Malcolm views dream reports as inherently first personal and repeatedly claims that the verbal report of a dream is the only criterion for believing that a dream took place. He adds that dreams cannot be checked in any other way without either showing that the individual is not fully asleep or by invoking a new conception of dreaming by relying on behavioural criteria such as patterns of physiology or movement during sleep. Behavioral criteria too, are insufficient to confirm that an individual is consciously experiencing their dreams, according to Malcolm. The best we can get from that are probabilistic indications of consciousness that will never be decisive. If scientists try to show that one is dreaming during sleep then those scientists have invoked a new conception of dreaming that does not resemble the old one, Malcolm alleges. He believes that where scientists appeal to behavioural criteria they are no longer inquiring into dreaming because the real conception of dreaming has only ever relied on dream reports. A dream is logically inseparable from the dream report and it cannot be assumed that the report refers to an experience during sleep. Malcolm thereby undermines the received view’s claim that “I dreamed that I was flying” entails that I had an experience during sleep in which I believed I was flying. Hence there is no way of conclusively confirming the idea that dreaming occurs during sleep at all.

Malcolm’s claim that the received view is unverifiable is inspired by a statement made by Wittgenstein who alludes to the possibility that there is no way of finding out if the memory of a dream corresponds to the dream as it actually occurred (Wittgenstein, 1953: part 2, § vii; p.415). Wittgenstein asks us what we should do about a man who has an especially bad memory. How can we trust his reports of dreams? The received view is committed to a crucial premise that when we recall dreams we recall the same content of the earlier experience. But Wittgenstein’s scenario establishes the possibility that an individual could recall content that did not occur. The question then arises as to why we should believe that somebody with even a good day-to-day memory is in any better position to remember earlier conscious experiences during sleep after waking.

In drawing attention to empirical work on dreams, Malcolm says that psychologists have come to be uncertain whether dreams occur during sleep or during the moment of waking up. The point for Malcolm is that it is “impossible to decide” between the two (Malcolm, 1956: p.29). Hence the question “when, in his sleep, did he dream?” is senseless. There is also a lack of criterion for the duration of dreams, that is how long they last in real time. Malcolm states that the concept of the time of occurrence of a dream and also how long a dream might last has no application in ordinary conversation about dreams. “In this sense, a dream is not an ‘occurrence’ and, therefore, not an occurrence during sleep” (Malcolm: 1956, p.30). Malcolm's epistemic claim has a metaphysical result, namely, that dreaming does not take place in time or space. The combination of the waking impression and the use of language has misled us into believing that dreams occur during sleep; “dreams” do not refer to anything over and above the waking report, according to Malcolm. This is why Malcolm thinks that the notion of “dreaming” is an exemplar of Wittgenstein’s idea of prejudices “produced by ‘grammatical illusions’” (Malcolm, 1959: p. 75).

ii. The Conflicting Definitions of “Sleep” and “Dreaming”

According to Malcolm’s second argument, he accuses the received view of contradicting itself and so the claim that dreams could consciously occur during sleep is incoherent. Sleep is supposed to entail a lack of experiential content, or at least an absence of intended behaviour, whereas dreaming is said to involve conscious experience. Experience implies consciousness; sleep implies a lack of consciousness; therefore the claim that dreams could occur during sleep implies consciousness and a lack of consciousness. So the received view results in a contradiction. This alleged contradiction of sleep and dreaming supports Malcolm’s first argument that dreams are unverifiable because any attempt to verify the dream report will just show that the individual was not asleep and so there is no way to verify that dreams could possibly occur during sleep. One might object to Malcolm that the content of a dream report could coincide well with a publicly verifiable event, such as the occurrence of thunder while the individual slept and thunder in the reported dream later. Malcolm claims that in this instance the individual could not be sound asleep if they are aware of their environment in any way. He alleges that instances such as nightmares and sleepwalking also invoke new conceptions of sleep and dreaming. By “sleep” Malcolm thinks that people have meant sound sleep as the paradigmatic example, namelessly, sleeping whilst showing no awareness of the outside environment and no behaviour.

iii. The Impossibility of Communicating or Making Judgments during Sleep

Malcolm takes communication as a crucial way of verifying that a mental state could be experienced. His third argument rules out the possibility of individuals communicating or making judgements during sleep, essentially closing off dreams as things we can know anything about. This third argument supports the first argument that dreams are unverifiable and anticipates a counter-claim that individuals might be able to report a dream as it occurs, thereby verifying it as a conscious experience. Malcolm claims that a person cannot say and be aware of saying the statement “I am asleep” without it being false. It is true that somebody could talk in his sleep and incidentally say “I am asleep” but he could not assert that he is asleep. If he is actually asleep then he is not aware of saying the statement (and so it is not an assertion), whilst if he is aware of saying the statement then he is not asleep. Since a sleeping individual cannot meaningfully assert that he is asleep, Malcolm concludes that communication between a sleeping individual and individuals who are awake is logically impossible.

As inherently first personal and retrospective reports, or so Malcolm alleges, the dream report fails Wittgensteinian criteria of being potentially verified as experiences. Malcolm alleges that there could be no intelligible mental state that could occur during sleep; any talk about mental states that could occur during sleep is meaningless. Malcolm assumes the Wittgensteinian point that talk about experiences gain meaning in virtue of their communicability. Communicability is necessary for the meaningfulness of folk psychological terms. Malcolm appeals to the “no private language argument” to rebut the idea that there could be a mental state which only one individual could privately experience and understand (for more on the private language argument, see Candlish & Wrisley, 2012).

The claim that there is a lack of possible communicability in sleep is key for Malcolm to cash out the further claim that one cannot make judgements during sleep. He does not believe that one could judge what they cannot communicate. According to Malcolm, since people cannot communicate during sleep, they cannot make judgements during sleep. He further adds that being unable to judge that one is asleep underlies the impossibility of being unable to have any mental experience during sleep. For, we could never observe an individual judge that he was asleep. This point relies on Malcolm’s second argument that the definitions of sleep and dreaming are in contradiction. There is nothing an individual could do to demonstrate he was making a judgement that did not also simultaneously show that he was awake. Of course, it seems possible that we could have an inner experience that we did not communicate to others. Malcolm points out that individuals in everyday waking instances could have communicated their experiences, at least modally. There is no possible world though, in which a sleeping individual could communicate with us his experience - so one cannot judge that one is asleep and dreaming. If Malcolm’s argument about the impossibility of making judgements in sleep works then his attack is detrimental to the received view’s premise that in sleep we can judge, reason, and so forth.

iv. Ramifications (contra Descartes)

Malcolm thinks that his challenge to the received view, if successful, undercuts Cartesian scepticism Descartes’ scepticism got off the ground when he raised the following issue: due to the similarity of dreams and waking experiences, my apparent waking experience might be a dream now and much of what I took to be knowledge is potentially untrue. A key premise for Descartes is that a dream is a sequence of experiences, the very same kind we can have whilst awake. This premise is undermined if dreams are not experiences at all. If the received view is unintelligible then Descartes cannot coherently compare waking life experiences to dreams: “if one cannot have thoughts while sound asleep, one cannot be deceived while sound asleep” (Malcolm: 1956, p.22). Descartes, championing the received view, failed to notice the incoherence in the notion that we can be asleep and aware of anything. Whenever we are aware of anything, whether it be the fire in front of us or otherwise, this is firm evidence that we are awake and that the world presented to us is as it really is.

c. Possible Objections to Malcolm

i. Putnam on the Conceptual Analysis of Dreaming

Part of Malcolm’s challenge to empirical work was his claim that the researchers have invoked new conceptions of sleep and dreaming (without realizing it) because of the new method of attempted verification. According to Malcolm’s charge, researchers are not really looking into dreaming as the received view understands the concept of dreaming. This was crucial for his attempt to undermine all empirical work on dreaming. Instead of relying on an individual’s waking report scientists may now try to infer from rapid eye movements or other physiological criteria that the individual is asleep and dreaming. For Malcolm, these scientists are working from a new conception of “sleep” and “dreaming” which only resembles the old one. Putnam objects to Malcolm’s claim, stating that science updates our concepts and does not replace them: the received view seeks confirmation in empirical work. In general, concepts are always being updated by new empirical knowledge. Putnam cites the example of Multiple Sclerosis (MS), a disease which is made very difficult to diagnose because the symptoms resemble those of other neurological diseases and not all of the symptoms are usually present. Furthermore, some neurologists have come to believe that MS is caused by a certain virus. Suppose a patient has a paradigmatic case of MS. Saying that the virus is the cause of the disease changes the concept because it involves new knowledge. On Malcolm’s general account, it would be a new understanding with a new concept and so the scientists would not be talking about MS at all (Putnam, 1962: p.219). Putnam believes that we should reject Malcolm’s view that future scientists are talking about a different disease. Analogously, we are still talking about the same thing when we talk about new ways of verifying the existence of dreams. If Putnam’s attack is successful then the work that scientists are doing on dreaming is about dreaming as the received view understands the concept, namely, conscious experiences that occur during sleep. If Putnam is right that scientists are not invoking a new conception of sleep and dreaming, then we can find other ways to verify our understanding of dreaming and the received view is continuous with empirical work.

ii. Distinguishing “State” and “Creature” Consciousness

David Rosenthal develops some conceptual vocabulary (Rosenthal: 2002, p.406), which arguably exposes a flaw in Malcolm’s reasoning. “Creature consciousness” is what any individual or animal displays when awake and responsive to external stimuli. “Creature unconsciousness” is what the individual or animal displays when unresponsive to external stimuli. “State consciousness,” on the other hand, refers to the mental state that occurs when one has an experience. This may be either internally or externally driven. I may have a perception of my environment or an imaginative idea without perceptual input. Malcolm evidently thinks that any form of state consciousness requires some degree of creature consciousness. But such a belief begs the question, so a Rosenthalian opponent of Malcolm might argue. It does not seem to be conceptually confused to believe that one can be responsive to internal stimuli (hence state conscious) without being responsive to external stimuli (hence creature unconscious). If, by “sleep” all we have meant is creature unconsciousness, then there is no reason to believe that an individual cannot have state conscious at the same time. An individual can be creature unconscious whilst having state consciousness, that is to say, an individual can be asleep and dreaming.

There are various reasons to believe that creature consciousness and state consciousness can come apart (and that state consciousness can plausibly occur without creature consciousness): the mental experience of dreaming can be gripping and the individual’s critical reasoning poor enough to be deceived into believing his dream is reality; most movement in sleep is not a response to outside stimuli at all but rather a response to internal phenomenology; the sleeping individual is never directly aware of his own body during sleep. Recall that Malcolm thought that sleep scientists cannot correlate movement in sleep with a later dream report because it detracted from their being fully asleep because creature consciousness and state consciousness can coexist. Malcolm is arguably wrong, then, to think that an individual moving in sleep detracts from their being fully asleep. This may block Malcolm’s appeal to sound sleep as the paradigmatic example of sleep. With the Rosenthalian distinction, we have reason to believe that even if an individual moves around in sleep, they are just as asleep as a sleeping individual lying completely still. The distinction may also count against Malcolm’s third argument against the possibility of communication in sleep. Of course, if creature consciousness is a necessary condition for communication then this distinction is not enough to undermine Malcolm’s third argument that communication cannot occur during sleep. A view where state consciousness alone suffices for communication will survive Malcolm’s third argument, on the other hand.

The apparent contradiction in sleep and dreaming that Malcolm claims existed will be avoided if the kind of consciousness implied by sleep is different to the kind Malcolm thinks is implied. The distinction might allow us to conclude that corroboration between a waking report and a publically verifiable sound, for example, can demonstrate that an individual is dreaming and yet asleep. Some dream content, as reported afterwards, seems to incorporate external stimuli that occurred at the same time as the dream. Malcolm calls this faint perception (Malcolm, 1956: p.22) of the environment and says that it detracts from an individual’s being fully asleep. Perhaps an objector to Malcolm can make a further, albeit controversial claim, in the Rosenthalian framework, to account for such dreams. For example, if there is thunder outside and an individual is asleep he might dream of being struck by Thor's hammer. His experience of the thunder is not the same sort of experience he would have had if he were awake during the thunder. The possible qualia are different. So Malcolm may be wrong in alleging that an individual is faintly aware of the outside environment if corroboration is attempted between a report and a verifiable sound, for example. Malcolm argued that such dreams are examples of individuals who are not fully asleep. But we can now see within the Rosenthalian framework how an individual could be creature unconscious (or simply “asleep” on the received view) and be taking in external stimuli unconsciously whilst having state consciousness that is not directly responsive to the external environment because he is not even faintly conscious of the external world.

See Nagel (1959), Yost (1959), Ayer (1960; 1961), Pears (1961), Kramer (1962) and Chappell (1963), for other replies to Malcolm.

d. Dennett’s Challenge to the Received View

i. A New Model of Dreaming: Uploading Unconscious Content

Dennett begins his attack on the received view of dreaming (the set of claims about dreams being consciously experienced during sleep) by questioning its authority. He does this by proposing a new model of dreaming. He is flexible in his approach and considers variations of his model. The crucial difference between his theory and the received view is that consciousness is not present during sleep on, what we might call Dennett’s uploading of unconscious content model of dreaming. Dennett does not say much about how this processing of unconscious material works, only that different memories are uploaded and woven together to create new content that will be recalled upon waking as though it was experienced during sleep, although it never was. Dennett is not repeating Malcolm’s first argument that dreaming is unverifiable. On the contrary, he believes that the issue will be settled empirically, though he claims that there is nothing to favour the received view’s own claim that dreams involve conscious experiences.

On the received view, the memory of an earlier dream is caused by the earlier dream experience and is the second time the content is experienced. On Dennett’s model, dream recall is the first time the content is experienced. Why believe that dreaming involves a lack of consciousness during sleep? One might cite evidence that the directions of rapid eye movements during sleep have been well correlated with the reports of dream content. An individual with predominantly horizontal eye movements might wake up and report that they were watching a tennis match in their dream. Dennett accommodates these (at the time) unconfirmed findings by arguing that even if it is the case that eye movement matches perfectly with the reported content, the unconscious is uploading memories and readying the content that will be experienced in the form of a false memory. The memory loading process is not conscious at the time of occurrence. Such findings would almost return us back to the received view – that the content of the dream does occur during sleep. It may be that the unconscious content is uploaded sequentially in the same order as the received view believes. We do not have proof that the individual is aware of the content of the dream during sleep. That is to say, the individual may not be having a conscious experience, even though the brain process involves the scenario which will be consciously experienced later, as though it was consciously experienced during sleep. Movement and apparent emotion in sleep can be accounted for too; a person twitches in their sleep as a memory with content involving a frightening scenario is uploaded and interwoven into a nightmarish narrative. It does not necessarily follow that the individual is conscious of this content being uploaded. This account is even plausible on an evolutionary account of sleep. The mind needs time to be unconscious and the brain and body needs to recalibrate. Thus, during sleep, the body is like a puppet, its strings being pulled by the memory loading process – although individuals show outward sign of emotion and bodily movement, there is nothing going on inside. Sometimes, though, what is remembered is the content being prepared, similar to the received view, only the individual is not aware of the content during sleep – this is why there can be matches between dream content reported and the direction of eye movement. Both sides of the debate agree that when dream content is being prepared some parts of the body move about as though it was a conscious experience, only Dennett denies that consciousness is present at the time and the received view believes that it is present.

Dennett also considers possibilities where the content of dream recall does not match the content that is uploaded. The content of the uploading during sleep might involve, say, window shopping in a local mall, yet the content that is recalled upon waking might recall flying over Paris. Having outlined the two theories – the received view and his own unconscious alternative - Dennett is merely making a sceptical point that the data of dream reports alone will not decide between them. What is to choose between them? Dennett believes that there is further evidence of a specific type of dream report that might decide the issue in favour of his own model.

ii. Accounting for New Data on Dreams: “Precognitive” Dreams

Any scientific theory must be able to account for all of the data. Dennett believes that there exists certain dream reports which the received view has failed to acknowledge and cannot account for. There exists anecdotal evidence that seems to suggest that dreams are concocted at the moment of waking, rather than experienced during sleep and is therefore a direct challenge to the received view. The most well-known anecdotal example was noted by French physicist Alfred Maury, who dreamt for some time of taking part in the French Revolution, before being forcibly taken to the Guillotine. As his head was about to be cut off in the dream, he woke up with the headboard falling on his neck (Freud, 1900: Chapter 1; Blackmore, 2005: p. 103). This anecdotal type of dream is well documented in films - one dreams of taking a long romantic vacation with a significant other, about to kiss them, only to wake up with the dog licking their face. In Dennett's own anecdotal example, he recalls dreaming for some time of looking for his neighbour’s goat. Eventually, the goat started bleating at the same time as his alarm clock went off which then woke him up (Dennett: 1976, p.157). The received view is committed to the claim that dreams, that is, conscious experiences, occur whilst an individual is asleep. The individual then awakes with the preserved memory of content from the dream. But the anecdotes pose a potentially fatal problem for the received view because the entire content of the dream seems to be caused by the stimulus that woke the individual up. The anecdotes make dreams look more like spontaneous imaginings on waking than the real time conscious experiences of the received view. Dennett argues that precognition is the only defense the received view can take against this implication. Given the paranormal connotations, this defense is redundant (Dennett: 1976, p. 158). Dennett provides a number of other anecdotal examples that imply that the narrative to dreams is triggered retrospectively, after waking. The content of the dream thematically and logically leads up to the end point, which is too similar to the waking stimulus to be a coincidence. The difficulty for the received view is to explain how the content could be working towards simultaneously ending with the sound, or equivalent experience, of something in the outside environment. Figures 2 and 3 depict the attempts to explain the new data on the received view and Dennett’s model.

 

Fig 2

 

 

Fig 3

If Dennett is right that the received view can only explain the anecdotes by appeal to precognition then we would do well to adopt a more plausible account of dreaming. Any attempt to suggest that individuals have premonitions about the near future from dreams would have little credibility. Dennett’s alternative unconscious uploading account might also allow for the retro-selection of appropriate content on the moment of waking. This theory allows for two ways of dreaming to regularly occur, both without conscious experience during sleep. The first way: dreams play out similar to the received view, only individuals lack consciousness of the content during sleep. Specifically, Dennett argues that during sleep different memories are uploaded by the unconscious and woven together to create the dream content that will eventually be experienced when the individual wakes. During sleep the content of the dream is gathered together by the brain, without conscious awareness, like recording a programme at night which is consciously played for the first time in waking moments. The second way: perhaps when one is woken up dramatically, the brain selects material (relevant to the nature of the waking stimulus) at the moment of waking which is threaded together as a new story, causing the individual to have a “hallucination of recollection” (Dennett, 1976: p.169). It might be that the unconscious was preparing entirely different content during sleep, which was set to be recalled, but that content is overwritten due to the dramatic interruption.

On Dennett’s unconscious uploading/retro-selection theory, “it is not like anything to dream, although it is like something to have dreamed” (Dennett, 1976: p.161). Consciousness is invoked on waking as one apparently remembers an event which had never consciously occurred before. On the above proposal, Dennett was not experiencing A – G, nor was the content for that dream even being prepared (though it might have been material prepared at an earlier date and selected now). Dennett also alludes to a library in the brain of undreamed dreams with various endings that are selected in the moments of waking to appropriately fit the narrative connotations of the stimuli that wakes the individual (Dennett, 1976: p. 158). His account is open to include variations of his model: perhaps various different endings might be selected – instead of a goat, other content may have competed for uploading through association – it may have been a dream involving going to the barbers and getting a haircut, before the buzzing of the clippers coincided with the alarm clock, or boarding a spaceship before it took off, had the sound of the alarm clock been more readily associated with these themes. Alternatively, the same ending might get fixed with alternative story-lines leading up to that ending. Dennett could have had a dream about going to his local job centre and being employed as a farmer, rather than searching for his neighbour’s goat, though the same ending of finding a bleating goat will stay in place.

As Dennett notes, if any of these possibilities turn out to be true then the received view is false and so they are serious rivals indeed. For all the evidence we have (in 1976), Dennett believes his unconscious uploading model is better placed to explain the data than the received view because the anecdotes prove that sometimes the conscious experience only occurs after sleep – an alien idea to the received view. Moreover, the received view should have no immediate advantage over the other models. Dennett separates the memory from the experience – the memory of a dream is first experienced consciously when it is recalled. The result is the same as Malcolm's – the received view is epistemologically and metaphysically flawed. If there is nothing it is like to have a dream during sleep, then the recall of dreams does not refer to any experience that occurred during sleep.

e. Possible Objections to Dennett

i. Lucid Dreaming

It might seem that lucid dreaming is an immediate objection to Malcolm and Dennett's arguments against the received view. Lucid dreaming occurs when an individual is aware during a dream that it is a dream. Lucid dreaming is therefore an example of experiencing a dream whilst one is asleep, therefore dreams must be experiences that occur during sleep. In replying to this objection, Dennett argues that lucid dreaming does not really occur. For, the waking impression might contain “the literary conceit of a dream within a dream” (Dennett: 1976, p.161). The recalled dream might just have content where it seems as though the individual is aware they are having a dream. Even this content might have been uploaded unconsciously during sleep. It might now seem that we have no obvious way of testing that the individual who reports having had a lucid dream is aware of the dream at the time. Dennett’s reply is undermined by a series of experiments carried out by Stephen LaBerge. LaBerge asked individuals who could lucid dream to voluntarily communicate with him in their lucid dreams by using the match in content of the dream to the direction of eye movements, thereby challenging Dennett’s claim that individuals are not conscious during sleep. The participants made pre-arranged and agreed eye movements. One might think that if lucid dreaming is really occurring, and the direction of REM might be linked to the content of the dream as it occurs, then one could pre-arrange some way of looking around in a lucid dream (that stands out from random eye movement) in order to test both theories. Stephen LaBerge carried out this experiment with positive results (LaBerge, 1990). The meaning of certain patterns of intended and previously arranged eye movement, for example, left-right-left-right can be a sleeping individual's way of expressing the fact that they are having a dream and aware that they are having a dream (see figure below).

 

Fig 4

 

In figure 4 above, the graph correlates with the reported dream content. The participant wakes and gives a dream report which matches the eye movement. The participant claims to have made five eye signals as agreed. The written report confirms the eye movements and the participant is not shown any of the physiological data until his report is given. He alleges to have gained lucidity in the first eye movement (1, LRLR). He then flew about in his dream, until 2, where he signalled that he thought he had awakened (2, LRx4). 2 is a false awakening which he then realized and went on to signal lucidity once again in 3. Here, he made too many eye signals and went on to correct this. This corroborates with the participant’s report. The participant accurately signals in the fifth set of eye movements that he is awake which coincides with the other physiological data that the participant is awake (participants were instructed to keep their eyes closed when they thought they had awoken).

The important implication of LaBerge’s experiment for Malcolm and Dennett’s arguments is that they can no longer dismiss the results of content matching with eye movement as merely “apparent” or “occasional” (as they took the content-relative-to-eye-movement claim at the time they wrote). Predictability is a hallmark of good science and these findings indicate that sleep science can achieve such status. The content-relativity thesis is confirmed by the findings because it is exactly what that thesis predicts in LaBerge’s experiment. The opposing thesis – that eye movement is not relative to content, cannot explain why the predicted result occurred. Namely, if we believe that eye content might match the content of the dream (and that lucid dreaming really can occur, contra Dennett), then if sleep scientists asked participants to do something in their dream (upon onset of lucidity) that would show that they are aware – this is what we would expect.

The received view gains further confirmation because in order to make sense of the communication as communication, one has to employ the notion that the direction of eye movement was being voluntarily expressed. If one is convinced by LaBerge’s arguments, then the notion of communicating during sleep undercuts Malcolm's privilege of the dream report and his claim that individuals could never communicate during sleep. We can empirically demonstrate, then, that the waking impression and the dream itself are logically separable. We need an account of why a sleeping individual would be exhibiting such systematic eye movements in LaBerge’s experiments. One reasonable conclusion is that the participant is mentally alert (has state consciousness) even though they are not awake (are not displaying creature consciousness). The most important implication of LaBerge’s study is that communication can arguably occur from within the dream without waking the individual up in any way. This supports the claim of the received view that we can be asleep and yet having a sequence of conscious experiences at the same time. The content of the dream occurs during sleep because the content is matched to the expected, systematic eye movement beyond coincidence. The systematic eye movement occurs exactly as predicted on the received view. Although Dennett could account for matched content to eye movement – he could not account for what seems like voluntary communication, which requires that an individual is conscious. This arguably leaves us in a position to cash out dreaming experience as verifiable as any other waking state.

The “content relative to eye movement” thesis can be accepted uncontroversially. Much dream content really does occur during sleep and this can be taken advantage of via participants communicating and thereby demonstrating conscious awareness. If LaBerge’s participants communicating with sleep scientists convinces, then the received view is right to think that the content of dreams does occur during sleep and that the dream content during sleep matches the memory of dream content. The findings are significant insofar as the participants influenced the dream content and thereby influenced eye movement through an act of agency within the dream.

The most important potential implication of LaBerge's findings, though the more controversial implication, is that communication can occur from within the dream without the individual waking up in any way, thereby confirming the received view. The content of the dream occurs during sleep because the study confirms that eye movement during sleep really does match up with the content of the dream as reported after sleep. LaBerge chose agreed eye movements rather than speech, because in this way, the individual would remain asleep. The experiment also challenges Malcolm’s claim that dreams cannot be communicated and were therefore logically unverifiable.

There exists a possible objection to the received view cashing in the results from LaBerge’s experiments, which can be raised in line with Dennett's unconscious memory-loading process. The objector might argue that the unconscious takes care of the pending task of looking around in the dream in the pre-arranged manner. If, according to Dennett's retro-selection model, the unconscious uploads memories from the day, then it follows that one of the memories it might upload could be of the participant discussing with LaBerge the specific eye movements to be made. So the unconscious might carry out the eye movements, misleading scientists into believing the sleeping individual is conscious. Once we start to credit the unconscious with being able to negotiate with waking memories during sleep and to make judgements, we either have to change our picture of the unconscious or conclude that these individuals are consciously aware during sleep.

LaBerge carried out a further experiment in which the timing of dreams was measured from within the dream. The experiment used lucid dreamers again who made the agreed signal. They then counted to 10 in their dream and then made the eye signal again. They were also asked to estimate the passing of 10 seconds without counting (see fig. 5 below). LaBerge has concluded from his experiments that experience in dreams happens roughly at the same time as in waking life. This second experiment carried out by LaBerge further blunts the Dennettian objection from unconsciously uploading the task. For, it seems to require agency (rather than unconscious processing) to negotiate how much time is passing before carrying out an action.

Fig 5

There is still room for scepticism towards dreams being consciously experienced during sleep. For, the sceptic could bite the bullet and say that lucid dreams are a special, anomalous case that does not apply to ordinary dreaming. Indeed, there is evidence that different parts of the brain are accessed, or more strongly activated, during lucid dreaming (pre-frontal brain regions, pre-cuneus and front polar regions). So there still remains the possibility that lucid dreaming is an example of consciously “waking up within a dream” whilst ordinary dreams are taken care of entirely by the unconscious (thus there is not anything-it's-like to have an ordinary dream occur during sleep). It might be useful to look at one report of the memory of a lucid dream:

In a dangerous part of San Francisco, for some reason I start crawling on the sidewalk. I start
to reflect: this is strange; why can't I walk? Can other people walk upright here? Is it just me
who has to crawl? I see a man in a suit walking under the streetlight. Now my curiosity is
replaced by fear. I think, crawling around like this may be interesting but it is not safe. Then I
think, I never do this – I always walk around San Francisco upright! This only happens in
dreams. Finally, it dawns on me: I must be dreaming! (LaBerge & Rheingold, 1990: p.35)

Notice that this is not just the memory-report of a lucid dream. Rather, it is the memory-report of an ordinary dream turning into a lucid dream. The report demonstrates an epistemic transition within the dream. With this in mind, it is difficult to maintain that lucid dreams are anomalous, or that lucid dreams bring about conscious experience. For, there is a gradual process of realization. We might want to also thus accept that the preceding ordinary dream is conscious too because whenever individuals gain lucidity in their dreams, there is a prior process of gradual realization that is present in the dream report. When an individual acquires lucidity in a dream, they are arguably already conscious but they begin to think more critically, as the above example demonstrates. Different parts of the brain are activated during lucidity, but these areas do not implicate consciousness. Rather, they are better correlated to the individual thinking more critically.

The gradual transition from ordinary dream to lucid dream can be more fully emphasized. It is possible to question oneself in a dream whilst failing to provide the right answer. One might disbelieve that one is awake and ask another dream character to hit oneself, apparently feel pain and so conclude that one is awake. It is important here to highlight the existence of partial-lucid dreams in order to show that dreams often involve irrationality and that there are fine-grained transitions to the fuller lucidity of critical thinking in dreams. A lucid dream, unlike ordinary dreams, is defined strictly in terms of the advanced epistemic status of the dreamer – the individual is having a lucid dream if they are aware that he or she is dreaming (Green, 1968: p.15). Lucid dreaming is defined in the weak sense as awareness that one is dreaming. Defined more strongly, lucid dreams involve controllability and a level of clarity akin to waking life. As stated, individuals can come close to realizing they are dreaming and miss out – they might dream about the nature of dreaming or lucid dreaming without realizing that they are currently in a dream themselves. Hence the norms of logical inference do not apply to ordinary dreams. One might look around in one’s dream and think “I must remember the people in this dream for my dream journal” without inferring that one is in a dream and acquiring lucidity. In another dream an individual might intend to tell another person in real life, who is featured in the dream, something they have learned just as soon as they wake up. In a dream, the dreamer could be accused by dream character Y of carrying out an action A – the dreamer thinks “I must wake up to tell Y that I did not carry out this action.” Implicitly, the dreamer knows it is a dream to make sense of the belief that they need to wake up, but they have not realized that Y will not have a continuation of the beliefs of their dream representative. The dream here involves awareness of the dream state without controllability over the dream (for they still seem to be going along with the content as though it were real). There is another type of common, partial-lucid dream in which people wake up from a dream and are able to return to it upon sleeping and change the course of the dream. This type of dream seems to involve controllability without awareness – they treat it as real and do not treat it as an acknowledged dream but are able to have much more control over the content than usual. Lucid dreamers used in experimental settings are much more experienced and have lucid dreams in the strongest sense – they are aware they are dreaming (and can maintain this awareness for a significant duration of time), have control over the content and have a level of clarity of thinking akin to waking life.

There are a number of further implications of LaBerge’s findings for various philosophical claims. The existence of communication during lucid dreaming challenges Augustine’s idea that dreams are not actions. If we can gain the same level of agency we have in waking life during lucid dreaming, then it might be the case that even ordinary dreams carry some, albeit reduced, form of agency. We might want to believe this new claim if we accept that agency is not suddenly invoked during lucidity, but is rather enhanced. The findings also open up the possibility to test the claim that somebody who is dreaming cannot tell that they are not awake, further undermining Descartes’ claim that dreaming and waking experiences are inherently indistinguishable. Previously, philosophers who wanted to resist the sceptical argument would say that someone who is dreaming might be able unable to distinguish the state they were in but not that someone awake is unable to distinguish, for example, Locke’s point that if we are in pain then we must be in an awake state. Had Descartes been a lucid dreamer, then when he was sat by the fire, his phrase might have come out as “I am now seated by the fire but I have also been deceived in dreams into believing I have been seated by the fire … though on occasion I have realized that I was just dreaming when apparently seated by the fire and so was not deceived at all!” It is surely a contingent fact that people rarely have lucid dreams. If people lucidly dreamt much more often, then Descartes’ sceptical dream argument would have had little to motivate it. Work on communicative lucid dreaming might also open up the possibility to test further phenomenally distinguishing features between the two states via individuals communicating statements about these features.

ii. Alternative Explanations for “Precognitive” Dreams

Dennett had cited an interesting type of dream report where the ending of the dream was strongly implied by the stimulus of awakening. For example: having a dream of getting married end with the sound of church bells ringing, which coincides with the sound of the alarm clock. These seemingly precognitive dreams are sometimes referred to in the literature as “the anecdotes” because of their generally non-experimental form. Though they are remote from scientific investigation, the mere existence of the anecdotes at all caused trouble for the received view and requires explanation. They provide extra evidence for Dennett’s proposed paradigm shift of dreaming. On the other hand, if there is enough evidence to claim that dreams are consciously experienced during sleep then the anecdotal data of dreams will not be a powerful enough counterexample; they will not warrant a paradigm shift in our thinking about dreams. The biggest challenge the anecdotes represent is that on occasion the memory can significantly deviate from the actual experience. On this view, false memories overriding the actual content of the dream does occur, but these experiences are the exception rather than the rule.

Though LaBerge’s experiments suggest that the content of dreams consciously occurs during sleep, the findings on their own are insufficient to draw the conclusion that all dreams occur during sleep. The existence of the anecdotes blocks one from drawing that conclusion. But these anecdotes can be explained on the received view. It is already known that the human species has specific bodily rhythms for sleep. Further, there is a noted phenomenon that people wake up at the same time even when their alarm clocks are off. Dennett himself says that he had got out his old alarm clock that he had not used in months and set the alarm himself (Dennett, 1976: p.157) – presumably for a time he usually gets up at anyway. If the subconscious can be credited with either creating a dream world on the received view or a dream memory on the Dennettian view and the personal body clock works with some degree of automaticity during sleep, one may well ask why the dream's anticipation (and symbolic representation) of this need be precognitive in a paranormal sense. Had Dennett woken up earlier, he may have lain in bed realizing that his alarm clock was going to go off, which is not considered an act of precognition. Had he thought this during sleep, the received view would expect it to be covered symbolically via associative imagery. Thus, perhaps Dennett is not being impartial in his treatment of dreams, and his argument begs the question since he is considering the received view's version of dreaming to be inferior to his own theory by assuming that thought in dreaming is completely oblivious to the banalities of the future.

Arguably, the other anecdotes can be explained away. Recall the most famous anecdote, where Maury was dragged to the guillotine with the headboard falling on his neck, waking him up (Freud discusses the case of Maury in the first chapter of his Interpretation of Dreams). Maury may have had some ongoing and subconscious awareness of the wobbliness of his headboard before it fell (presumably it did not fall without movement on his part – possibly in resistance to being beheaded. Maury's could thus be a type of dreaming involving self-fulfilling prophecy) that is left out of the overall account. Dennett's account agrees that any unconscious awareness of the outside environment is represented differently in the dream. Maury would have had enough time to form the simple association of his headboard being like a guillotine from the French Revolution. If he had some awareness of the looseness of his headboard, then the thought: “if this headboard falls on me it will be like being beheaded,” would be appropriately synchronized into the dream.

Though it is possible to provide alternative explanation for some of the anecdotes, it might be worth dividing Dennett’s anecdotes into hard and soft anecdotes. A hard anecdote is outlined by Dennett: a car backfires outside and an individual wakes up with the memory of a dream logically leading up to being shot. The soft anecdotes, those already mentioned (such as Maury’s and Dennett’s own examples), can at least be alternatively explained. The hard anecdotes, on the other hand, cannot simply be explained by appeal to body clocks and anticipation in sleep. The hard anecdotes reveal that the dreamer has no idea what will wake them up in the morning, if anything (maybe the alarm will not actually go off; or the truck backfiring could occur at any point). The soft anecdotes might involve outside stimuli being unconsciously incorporated into the dream. The only hard anecdote mentioned in Dennett’s paper is made up by Dennett himself to outline his theory, rather than representing a genuine example of a dream. Notice that a hard anecdote could favour the received view – if experimenters switched off an alarm that a participant had set and that individual woke with a dream which seemed to anticipate the alarm going off at the set time (for example, had Dennett’s goat dream occurred despite his alarm not going off) then we might do best to conclude that the dream consciously occurred during sleep in a sequential order leading up to the awakening. Dennett is right that the issue is worth empirically investigating. If a survey found that hard anecdote-like dreams (such as a truck back-firing and waking with a dream thematically similar) occur often, then the received view is either dis-confirmed or must find a way to make room for such dreams.

Dennett might reply that he does not need to wait for the empirical evidence to reveal that the hard anecdotes are common. He might simply deny that the alternative explanation of the soft anecdotes is not credible. If the attempt to explain the soft anecdotes are not credible (as a Dennettian might object), they at least draw attention to the extraneous variables in each of the anecdotes. Dennett's sole reason for preferring his retro-selection theory over the received view is so an explanation can account for the anecdotal data. But Dennett uses his own alarm clock which he himself set the night before; Maury uses his own bed; Dennett of course admits that the evidence is anecdotal and not experimental. In one of the few actual experiments carried out, water is slowly dripped onto a sleeping participant’s back to wake them up, but this is not timed and is akin to a soft anecdote. More empirical work needs to be done to clarify the issue and for the debate to move forward.

The anecdotes are a specific subclass of prophetic dreams. It is worth noting a related issue about dreams which are alleged to have a more prophetic nature. It seems from the subjective point of view that if one was to have had a dream about a plane crash the night before (or morning of) September 11th 2001 this would have been a premonitory dream. Or one might dream of a relative or celebrity dying and then wake to find this actually happens in real life. The probability of the occurrence of a dream being loosely (or even exactly) about an unforeseen, future event is increased when one has a whole lifetime of dreams – a lifetime to generate one or two coincidences. The dreams which are not premonitory are under-reported and the apparently prophetic dreams are over-reported. The probability of having a dream with content vaguely similar to the future is increased by the fact that a single individual has many dreams over a lifetime. Big events are witnessed and acknowledged by large numbers of people which increases the probability that someone will have a dream with similar content (Dawkins, 1998: p.158). No doubt when the twin towers were attacked some people just so happened to have dreams about plane crashes, and a few might have even had dreams more or less related to planes crashing into towers, or even the Twin Towers. Billions of dreams would have been generated the night prior, as they are every night around the world, and so some would have invariably “hit the mark.” Dennett’s anecdotes are somewhat different, but they too may have the same problem of being over-reported in this way. At the same time, they may also suffer from being under-reported because they are not always obviously related to the stimulus of awakening, particularly where someone pays attention to the content of the dream and forgets how they awakened. Hence, the extent to which we experience anecdote-like dreams is currently uncertain, though they can be explained on the received view.

4. The Function of Dreaming

The function of dreaming – exactly why we dream and what purpose it could fulfil in helping us to survive and reproduce - is explained in evolutionary terms of natural selection. Natural selection is best understood as operating through three principles: Variation, Heredity and Selection. A group of living creatures within a species vary from one another in their traits, their traits are passed on to their own offspring, and there is competition for survival and reproduction amongst all of these creatures. The result is that those creatures that have traits better suited for surviving and reproducing will be precisely the creatures to survive, reproduce and pass on the successful traits. Most traits of any organism are implicated in helping it to survive and thereby typically serve some purpose. Although the question of what dreaming might do for us has to this day remained a mystery, there has never been a shortage of proposed theories. The most sustained first attempt to account for why we dream comes from Freud (1900), whose theory was countered by his friend and later adversary Carl Jung. An outline of these two early approaches will be followed by a leading theory in philosophical and neuro-biological literature: that dreaming is an evolutionary by-product. On this view, dreaming has no function but comes as a side effect of other useful traits, namely, cognition and sleep. A contemporary theory opposing the view that dreaming has no function, in comparison, holds that dreaming is a highly advantageous state where the content of the dream aids an organism in later waking behaviour that is survival-enhancing by rehearsing the perception and avoidance of threat.

a. Early Approaches

i. Freud: Psychoanalysis

The psychoanalytic approach, initiated by Freud, gives high esteem to dreams as a key source of insight into, and the main method of opening up, the unconscious (Freud, 1900: §VII, E, p.381). Psychoanalysis is a type of therapy aimed at helping people overcome mental problems. Therapy often involves in depth analyses of patient’s dreams. In order to analyse dreams though, Freudian psychoanalysis is committed to an assumption that dreams are fulfilling a certain function. Freud explicitly put forward a theory of the function of dreams. He believed that dreams have not been culturally generated by humans, as Malcolm thought, but are rather a mental activity that our ancestors also experienced. During sleep, the mind is disconnected from the external world but remains instinctual. The psychoanalytic take on dreaming is better understood in terms of Freud’s overall picture of the mind, which he split into id, ego and super-ego. The id is an entirely unconscious part of the mind, something we cannot gain control of, but is rather only systematically suppressed. It is present at birth, does not understand the differences between opposites and seeks to satisfy its continually generated libidinal instinctual impulses (Storr, 1989: p.61). The id precedes any sense of self, is chaotic, aggressive, unorganised, produces no collective will and is incapable of making value judgements As the child develops and grows up his instinctual needs as a baby are repressed and covered up (Storr, 1989: p.63). If humans were guided only by the id they would behave like babies, trying to fulfil their every need instantly, without being able to wait; the id has no conception of time. It is the id that will get an individual into social trouble. The super-ego is the opposing, counterbalance to the id, containing all of our social norms such as morality. Though we grow up and develop egos and super-egos, the id constantly generates new desires that pressurize us in our overall psychologies and social relations. The work of repression is constant for as long as we are alive. The super-ego is mostly unconscious. In the case of dreams, the work of censorship is carried out by the super-ego. The ego was initially conceived by Freud as our sense of self. He later thought of it more as planning, delayed gratification and other types of thinking that have developed late in evolution. The ego is mostly conscious and has to balance the struggle between the id and the super-ego and also in navigating the external and internal worlds. This means that we experience the continual power struggle between the super-ego and the id. The ego has to meet a quota of fulfilling some of the id’s desires, but only where this will marginally affect the individual.

Freud’s first topographical division of the mind consisted of the conscious, pre-conscious and unconscious (the pre-conscious is that which is not quite conscious but could quite easily be brought into conscious awareness). His second division of the mind into id, ego and super-ego explains how consciousness can become complicated when the two topographies are superimposed upon one another. Mental content from the unconscious constantly struggles to become conscious. Dreams are an example of unconscious content coming up to the conscious and being partially confronted in awareness, although the content is distorted. Dreaming is an opportunity for the desires of the id to be satisfied without causing the individual too much trouble. We cannot experience the desires of the id in naked form, for they would be too disturbing. The super-ego finds various ways of censoring a dream and fulfilling the desires latently. Our conscious attention is effectively misdirected. What we recall of dreams is further distorted as repression and censorship continues into attempted recollections of the dream. The resulting dream is always a compromise between disguise and the direct expression of the id’s desires. The censorship is carried out in various ways (Hopkins, 1991: pp. 112-113). Images which are associated with each other are condensed (two people might become one, characters may morph based on fleeting similarities) and emotions are displaced onto other objects. Dreams are woven together in a story-like element to further absorb the dreamer in the manifest content.

It is better that these wishes come disguised in apparently nonsensical stories in order to stop the dreamer from awakening in horror (Flanagan: 2000, p.43). The content of the dream, even with some censorship in place, still might shock an individual on waking reflection and is therefore further distorted by the time it reaches memory, for the censor is still at work. Malcolm positively cited a psychoanalyst who had claimed that the psychoanalyst is really interested in what the patient thought the dream was about (that is, the memory of the dream) rather than the actual experience (Malcolm, 1959: pp. 121-123, Appendix).

Though Freud was not an evolutionary biologist, his theory of dreams can be easily recast in evolutionary terms of natural selection. Freud thought that we dream in the way we do because it aids individuals in surviving and so is passed on and therefore positively selected. Individuals who dreamt in a significantly different way would not have survived and reproduced, and their way of dreaming would have died with them. But how does dreaming help individuals to survive? Freud postulates that dreaming simultaneously serves two functions. The primary function at the psychological level is wish fulfilment (Storr, 1989: p.44). During the day humans have far too many desires than they could possibly satisfy. These are the desires continually generated by the id. Desire often provides the impetus for action. If acted upon, some of these desires might get the individual killed or in social trouble, such as isolation or ostracism which may potentially result in not reproducing. Since wish fulfilment occurring during sleep is a mechanism that could keep their desires in check, the mechanism would be selected for. Freud claims that, having fulfilled the multifarious desires of the id in sleep, they can remain suppressed during the following days. The individual no longer needs to carry the action out in waking life, thereby potentially stopping the individual from being killed or having fitness levels severely reduced. This provides reason as to why we would need to sleep with conscious imagery. Freud only applied his theory to humans but it could be extrapolated to other animals that also have desires – for example, mammals and other vertebrates, though the desires of most members of the animal kingdom will surely be less complex than that of human desire.

The primary function at the physiological level is to keep an individual asleep while satisfying unconscious desires (Freud, 1900: §V, C, p.234). Also, it is clear that keeping an individual asleep and stopping him or her from actually carrying out the desires during sleep is beneficial to survival. So though the individual has their desires satisfied during sleep, it is done so in a disguised manner. Here, Freud separates the dream into manifest and latent content. The manifest content is the actual content that is experienced and recalled at the surface level (a dream of travelling on a train as it goes through a tunnel). The latent content is the underlying desire that is being fulfilled by the manifest content (a desire for sexual intercourse with somebody that will land the dreaming individual in trouble). The individual is kept asleep by the unconscious disguising the wishes.

What about dreams where the manifest content seems to be emotionally painful, distressing, or a good example of an anxiety dream, rather than wish fulfilment? How can our desires be satisfied when our experiences do not seem to involve what we wanted? Freud suggests that these can be examples where the dream fails to properly disguise the content. Indeed, these usually wake the individual up. Freud was aware of an early study which suggested that dream content is biased towards the negative (Freud, 1900: pp. 193-194) – a study which has been subsequently confirmed. Freud’s distinction between manifest and latent content explains away this objection. The underlying, latent content carries the wish and dreams are distorted by a psychological censor because they will wake an individual up if they are too disturbing, and then the desire will remain unsuppressed. Perhaps dreams operate with an emotion which is the opposite of gratification precisely to distract the sleeping individual from the true nature of the desire. Wish fulfilment might be carried out in the form of an anxiety dream where the desire is especially disturbing if realized. Other anxiety dreams can actually fulfil wishes through displacement of the emotions. Freud uses an example of one of his own dreams where a patient is infected but it fulfils the wish of alleviating the guilt he felt that he could not cure her (the dream of Irma’s injection). The dream allowed the blame to be lifted away from himself and projected onto a fellow doctor who was responsible for the injection. Despite the displeasure of the dream, the wish for the alleviation guilt was fulfilled.

The dream for Freudians relies on a distinction between indicative and imperative content. An indicative state of mind is where my representational systems show the world to be a certain way. The exemplar instance of indicative representations is belief. I might accurately perceive and believe that it is raining and I thus have an indicative representational mental state. Imperative states of mind, on the other hand, are ones in which I desire the world to be a certain way – a way that is different to the way it currently is. I might desire that it will snow. A dream is an instance of an indicative representation replacing an imperative one in order to suppress a desire. We see something in a dream and believe it is there in front of us. This is what we want and what we desired, so once we believe we have it, the desire is vanquished, making it unlikely we will try to satisfy the desire in waking life.

ii. Jung: Analytic Psychology

Trying to provide even a simple exposition of Freud’s or Jung’s theories of dreams will not please all scholars and practitioners that adhere to the thinkers’ traditions. Drawing out the differences or similarities between their views is an exegetical task and the resulting statements about their theories are thus always debatable. Many working in the tradition of psychoanalysis or analytical psychology opt for a synthesis between their views. At the risk of caricaturing Jung’s theory of dreams, the differences in their views will be emphasized to contrast with Freud’s.

Like Freud, Jung also believed that dream analysis is a major way of gaining knowledge about the unconscious – a deep facet of the mind that has been present in our ancestors throughout evolutionary history. But Jung’s evolutionary story of dreaming differs from Freud’s. Whereas Freud understood dreams as using memory from the days preceding the dream (particularly the “day residue” of the day immediately leading up to the dream) and earlier childhood experiences, Jung thought the dream also worked with more distant material: the collective unconscious. The collective unconscious is where the ancestral memories of the species are stored and are common to all people. Some philosophers, such as Locke, had believed the mind is a blank slate. Jung believed that the collective unconscious underlies the psychology of all humans and is even identical across some different species. The collective unconscious is especially pronounced in dreaming where universal symbols are processed, known as the archetypes. The distinction between signs and symbols is an important one (Jung, 1968: p.3). Signs refer to what is already known, whereas symbols contain a multiplicity of meanings (Mathers, 2001: p.116). More, indeed, than can be captured, thereby always leaving an unknowable aspect, and hence always requiring further work to think about the dream, thereby hinting at future perspectives one may take toward oneself and one’s dreams (Mathers, 2001: p.116).

Jung saw dreaming as playing an integral role in the overall architecture of the mind and conducive to surviving in the world for during the process of dreaming the day’s experiences are connected to previous experiences and our whole personal history. Whereas Freud thought that the adaptive advantage to dreams was to distract us and thereby keep us asleep, Jung thought the reverse: we need to sleep in order to dream and dreaming serves multiple functions. What does dreaming do for us, according to Jung? Dreams compensate for imbalances in the conscious attitudes of the dreamer. Psychology depends upon the interplay of opposites (Jung, 1968: p.47). By dreaming of opposite possibilities to waking life, such as a logical individual (with a strong thinking function) having dreams which are much more feeling–based, the balance is restored (Stevens, 1994: p.106). “Dreams perform some homeostatic or self-regulatory function … they obey the biological imperative of adaptation in the interests of personal adjustment, growth, and survival” (Stevens, 1994: p.104). They play a role in keeping the individual appropriately adapted to their social setting. Dreaming also carries out a more general type of compensation, concerning the psychology of gender. The psyche is essentially androgynous and so dreams provide an opportunity to balance the overall self to an individual’s opposite gender that make up their personality and mind. Hence dreams are not the mere “guardians of sleep” as Freud thought, but are rather a necessary part to maintaining psychological well being and development. When the conscious is not put in touch with the unconscious, homeostasis is lost and psychological disturbance will result (Jung, 1968: p.37). Dreams serve up unconscious content that has been repressed, ignored or undervalued in waking life. Although he emphasized an objective element to dreaming (that the unconscious often makes use of universal and culturally shared symbols), Jung was opposed to the possibility of a fixed dream dictionary because the meaning of symbols will change depending on the dreamer and over time as they associate images with different meanings.

Jung agrees with Freud that there are a wealth of symbols and allegorical imagery that can stand in for the sexual act, from breaking down a door to placing a sword in a sheath. In the course of his analysis, Freud would gradually move from manifest content to the latent content, though he did encourage the dreamer to give their own interpretations through free association. Jung believed that the unconscious choice of symbol itself is just as important and can tell us something about that individual (Jung, 1968: p.14). Alternatively, apparent phallic symbols might symbolize other notions – a key in a lock might symbolize hope or security, rather than anything sexual. The dream imagery, what Freud called the manifest content, is what will reveal the meaning of the dream. Where Freud had asked “What is the dream trying to hide?” Jung asks: “What is the dream trying to express or communicate?” because dreams occur without a censor: they are “undistorted and purposeful” (Whitmont & Perera, 1989: p.1).

Another function of dreaming that distinguishes Jung’s from Freud’s account is that dreams provide images of the possibilities the future may have in store for the sleeping individual. Not that dreams are precognitive in a paranormal sense, Jung emphasized, but the unconscious clearly does entertain counter-factual situations during sleep. Those possibilities entertained are usually general aspects of human character that are common to us all (Johnson, 2009: p.46). Dreams sometimes warn us of dangerous upcoming events, but all the same, they do not always do so (Jung, 1968: p.36). The connection of present events to past experience is where dreams are especially functional (Mathers, 2001: p.126). Freud and Jung’s theories clearly overlap here. But whereas Freud assessed dreams in terms of looking back into the past, especially the antagonisms of childhood experience, dreaming for Jung importantly also lays out the possibilities of the future. This clearly has survival value, since it is in the future where that individual will eventually develop and try to survive and reproduce. Dreaming for Jung is like “dreaming” in the other sense – that of aspiring, wishing and hoping. Dreams point towards our future development and individuation. The notion of personal development brought about by dreaming might depend upon regularly recalling a dream, which is something that Freud’s claim of wish fulfilment need not be committed to, and it is not clear how this deals with animal’s dreaming.

Dreams are a special instance of the collective unconscious at work, where we can trace much more ancient symbolism. The collective unconscious gives rise to the archetypes: “the universal patterns or tendencies in the human unconscious that find their way into our individual psyches and form us. They are actually the psychological building blocks of energy that combine together to create the individual psyche” (Johnson, 2009: p.46). Dreams demonstrate how the unconscious processes thought in “the language of symbolism” (Johnson, 2009: p.4). The most important function of dreams is teaching us how to think symbolically and deal with communication from the unconscious. Dreams always have a multiplicity of meanings, can be re-interpreted and new meanings discovered. Jung believed that “meaning making enhances survival” (Mathers, 2001: p.117). According to Flanagan, it is much harder to construe Jung’s theory of dreams as adhering to the basic tenets of evolutionary biology than Freud’s, for two fundamental reasons. Firstly, why would the collective unconscious expressing symbols relevant to the species have any gains in terms of reproductive success? Secondly, Jung’s theory is more often interpreted in Lamarckian, and not Darwinian, terms, which leaves it out in the cold in regards to accepted evolutionary biology (Flanagan, 2000: p.44). According to Lamarck’s conception of evolution, traits developed during a lifetime can then be subsequently passed onto the next generation. Hence Lamarck believed that the giraffe got its long neck because one stretched its neck during its lifetime to reach high up leaves and this made the neck longer, a trait which was passed onto its offspring. According to the  widely favoured Darwinian view of evolution, those giraffes that just so happened to have a longer neck would have had access to the source of food over those with shorter necks, and would have been selected. Jung’s theory is interpreted as Lamarckian rather than Darwinian because symbols that are learned during an individual’s particular historical period can be genetically encoded and passed on (Flanagan, 2000: p.64). Perhaps one could reply in Jungian-Darwinian terms that those individuals who just so happened to be born with a brain receptive to certain symbols having certain meanings (rather than learning them), survived over those individuals that did not. But then Flanagan’s first reason remains as an objection – what advantage would this have in terms of surviving? Others have argued that the collective unconscious is actually much more scientifically credible than critics have taken it to be. According to the line of argument, the collective unconscious essentially coincides with current views about innate behaviours, in fields such as socio-biology and ethology (Stevens, 1994: p.51). Appropriate environmental (or cognitive) stimuli trigger patterns of behaviours or thought that are inherited, such as hunting, fighting and mothering. In humans, there are, for example, the universal expressions of emotion (anger, disgust, fear, happiness, sadness, surprise). Humans and other mammals have an inbuilt fear of snakes that we do not need to learn. These patterns can be found in dreams. The dream images are generated by homologous neural structures that are shared amongst animals, not merely passed on to the next generation as images. The Jungian can dodge the accusation of Lamarckism by arguing that dreams involve inherited patterns of behaviour based on epigenetic rules (the genetically inherited rules upon which development then proceeds for an individual) and arguing that epigenetics does not necessarily need to endorse Lamarckism (epigenetics is a hot topic in the philosophy of biology. For a cogent introduction, readers can consult Jablonka & Lamb, 2005). Alternatively, in light of epigenetics, the Jungian can defend a Lamarackist view of evolution - a re-emerging but still controversial position.

To rehearse the differences: Freud believed that dreams are the result of a power struggle between the id’s constantly generating desires and the super-ego’s censorship of the exact nature of these desires; various techniques are employed by the censor, including emotional displacement, weaving together a narrative to pay attention to and reworking the latent desires into the manifest content we experience and eventually and occasionally recollect; dreams are a distraction to keep us asleep; dreaming is a mechanism that has been selected to provide social stability amongst individuals. Dreams essentially deal with one’s relationship to their past. Jung thought dreams point towards the future development of the individual. The experiences which process symbols shared amongst the species are a form of compensation to keep the individual at a psychological homeostasis. Dreams do not especially deal with sexuality but have a more general attempt for the individual to understand themselves and the world they exist in.

b. Contemporary Approaches

i. Pluralism

Flanagan represents a nuanced position in which dreaming has no fitness-enhancing effects on an organism that dreams, but neither does it detract from their fitness. Dreams are the by-products of sleep. The notion of evolutionary by-product, or spandrel (see figures 6 and 7), was first introduced by the evolutionary Pluralists Gould and Lewontin in “The Spandrels of San Marco and Panglossian Paradigm” where the authors borrowed the term from the field of architecture. Evolutionary Pluralism claims that traits in the natural world are not always the result of natural selection, but potentially for a plurality of other reasons. The debate between Adaptationists and Pluralists centres on the pervasiveness of natural selection in shaping traits. Pluralists look for factors other than natural selection in shaping a trait, such as genetic drift and structural constraints on development. One important example is the spandrel. Some traits might be necessary by-products of the design of the overall organism.

 

Fig 6

 

 

Fig 7

 

The two separate architectural examples, figures 6 and 7, display spandrels as roughly triangular spaces. The point that Gould and Lewontin are making by introducing the notion of spandrel is that some aspects of the design of an object inevitably come as a side-effect. Perhaps the architect only wanted archways and a dome. In producing such a work of architecture, spandrels cannot be avoided. If architecture can tell us something about metaphysical truths, then might dreams be such spandrels, lodged in between thought and sleep? Flanagan, an evolutionary Pluralist, argues that there is no fitness-enhancing function of dreaming. Though, as a matter of structure, we cannot avoid dreaming for dreams sit in between the functioning of the mind and sleep, like spandrels between two architecturally desired pillars in an archway. Hence Flanagan’s argument is that in evolutionary biological terms, dreaming is not for anything – it just comes as a side effect to the general architecture of the mind. He states more strongly that “so long as a spandrel does not come to detract from fitness, it can sit there forever as a side effect or free rider without acquiring any use whatsoever” (Flanagan, 2000: p.108). Dreaming neither serves the function of wish-fulfilment or psychological homeostasis. Flanagan emphasizes the disorganized nature of dreaming, something which can clearly be appealed to given any individual’s experience of dreams. To be sure, wish-fulfilment and apparent psychological compensation sometimes appear in dreams, but this is because we are just thinking during sleep and so a myriad of human cognition will take place. Another reason put forward by Flanagan for the view that dreams are spandrels is that, unlike for sleep, there is nothing close to an ideal adaptation explanation for dreaming (Flanagan, 2000: p.113). The ideal explanation lays out what evidence there is that selection has operated on the trait, gives proof that the trait is heritable, provides an explanation of why some types of the trait are better adapted than others in different environments and amongst other species and also offers evidence of how later versions of the trait are derived from earlier ones. The spandrel thesis about dreaming is more plausible, then, because trying to argue that dreams have function ends up as nothing more than a “just-so” story, the result of speculation and guess work that cannot meet the standards of an ideal adaptation explanation.

ii. Adaptationism

Antti Revonsuo stands in opposition to Flanagan by arguing that dreaming is an adaptation. He also stands in opposition to Freud and Jung in that the function of dreams is not to deliver wish fulfilment whilst keeping the individual asleep or to connect an individual to the symbolism of the collective unconscious. Revonsuo strives to deliver an account that meets the stringent criteria of a scientific explanation of the adaptation of dreaming. Though there have been many attempts to explain dreaming as an Adaptation, few come close to the ideal adaptation explanation, and those functional theories favoured by neurocognitive scientists (for example, dreams are for consolidating memories or for forgetting useless information) cannot clearly distinguish their theory of the function of dreams from the function of sleep, that is, the spandrel thesis. The Threat Simulation Theory account can be clearly distinguished from the spandrel thesis. According to Revonsuo, the actual content of dreams is helpful to the survival of an organism because dreaming enhances behaviours in waking life such as perceiving and avoiding threat. Revonsuo’s Threat Simulation Theory presents dreams as specializing in the recreation of life-like threatening scenarios. His six claims are as follows: Claim 1: Dream experience is more an organized state of mind than disorganized; Claim 2: Dreaming is tailored to and biased toward simulating threatening events of all kinds found in waking life; Claim 3: Genuine threats experienced in waking life have a profound effect on subsequent dreaming; Claim 4: Dreams provide realistic simulacra of waking life threatening scenarios and waking consciousness generally; Claim 5: Simulation of perceptual and motor activities leads to enhanced performance even when the rehearsal is not recalled later; Claim 6: Dreaming has been selected for (Revonsuo, 2000).

The Threat Simulation Theory is committed to a certain conception of dreams as a realistic and organized state of consciousness, as implied by Claim 1. This claim motivates the challenge to any spandrel thesis of dreams by asking why dreams would show the level of organization that they do, namely, the construction and engagement of virtual realities, if they were just mere “mental noise” as a spandrel thesis might imply or be committed to. Dreaming is allegedly similar to waking life and is indeed experienced as waking life at least at the time of the dream (Valli & Revonsuo, 2009: p.18). These features of dreams are essential in putting in motion the same sort of reaction to threat that will occur during waking life and aid survival. Hence the dream self should be able to react in the dream situation with reasonable courses of action to combat the perceived threat in ways that would also be appropriate in real life. Revonsuo appeals to phenomenological data where a significant proportion of dreams involve situations in which the dreamer comes under attack. We do indeed generally have more negative emotions during an REM related dream. This claim is well supported by experiential examples of dreaming, where anxiety is the most frequent emotion in dreaming, joy/ elation was second and anger third (Hobson, 1994: p.157), making two thirds of dream emotion negative. That dreams process negative emotions likely occurs because the amygdala is highly activated. The amygdala is also the key brain part implicated in the “fight or flight” sympathetic nervous system response to especially intense life-threatening situations. During waking hours this part of the brain is used in handling unpleasant emotions like anxiety, intense fear or anger. This is well explained by the Threat Simulation Theory. We experience more threats in dreams (and especially demanding ones) than in waking life because it is selected to be especially difficult, leaving the individual bestowed with a surplus of successful threat avoidance strategies, coping skills and abilities to anticipate, detect and out-manoeuvre the subtleties of certain threats.

Though Revonsuo claims that dreams specialize in the full panoply of threatening scenarios that will effect overall survival, the most obvious example is the “fight or flight” response. All instances of stress in waking life occur when an individual feels threatened and this will feed back into the system of acknowledging what is dangerous and what is not. In waking life, the fight or flight response essentially involves making a snap decision in a life or death situation to fight a predatory enemy or flee from the scene. The activation of the Sympathetic Nervous System – the stress response implicated in the fight or flight response – is an involuntary, unconsciously initiated process. One might object to Claims 1 and 4, that many dreams simply do not seem realistic representations of threatening scenarios such as those requiring the fight or flight response. One study found, for example, that many recurrent dreams are unrealistic (Zadra et al, 2006). Revonsuo has some scope for manoeuvre for he believes that dreams may no longer be adaptive due to the dramatic environmental changes, and the possible adaptation for human dream consciousness was when humans were hunter-gatherers in the Pleistocene environment over a period of hundreds of thousands of years; so dream content may now no longer seem to have the same function, given that we live in a radically different environment. Dreams are then comparable to the human appendix – useful and adaptive in times when our diet was radically different, but now an essentially redundant and, occasionally, maladaptive vestigial trait.

Dreams may have also become more lax in representing threatening content in the Western world, since life and death threatening situations are no longer anywhere near as common as in the evolutionary past. This will be the case because a lack of exposure to threat in waking life will not activate the threat simulation system of dreaming as it did in earlier times. Revonsuo uses evidence of ordinary dream reports from the population but he also cites cases of psychopathology such as the dreams of individuals with post-traumatic stress disorder (PTSD), where, crucially, their traumatic and threatening experiences dramatically affects what they dream about. Thus the relationship between dreaming and experiencing threats in waking life is bi-directional: Dreams try to anticipate the possible threats of waking life and improve the speed of perceiving and ways of reacting to them. At the same time, any perceived threats that are actually experienced in waking life will alter the course of later dreaming to re-simulate those threats perceived. This feedback element dovetails with Claim 4 for an accurate picture will be built as information is constructed from the real world.

Perhaps the updating element of the Threat Simulation Theory (Claim 4 – that individuals learn from what is threatening and this gets passed onto offspring) suffers from the same accusation of Lamarckism that faces Jung’s theory. Revonsuo believes that dreaming during sleep allows an individual to repetitively rehearse the neurocognitive mechanisms that are indispensable to waking life threat perception and avoidance. Flanagan asks why behaviour that is instinctual would need to be repetitively rehearsed, but what is provided by Revonsuo is an explanation of how instinct is actually preserved in animals. But not all of our dreams are threatening. This fact surely helps the Threat Simulation Theory to show that there is variation amongst the trait and that the threatening type comes to dominate. The neural mechanisms, or hardware, underlying the ability to dream are transferred genetically and became common in the population. Those individuals with an insufficient number of threatening dreams were not able to survive to pass on the trait because they were left ill prepared for the trials and tribulations of the real world’s evolutionary environment. One might still object that survival – the avoidance of threat – is only one half of propagating a trait. Individuals also have to reproduce for the trait to be passed on. So dreams ought to also specialize in enhancing behaviours that help individuals to find mates. Animals and humans have many and varied courting rituals, requiring complicated behaviours If dreaming can, and does, make any difference to behaviour in waking life as Revonsuo must claim, then why would the presence of mate selection behaviours not make up a big factor in dreams? In humans, no more than 6% of adult dreams contain direct sexual themes (Flanagan, 2000: p.149). There is also a slight gender difference in that males tend to dream more of male characters than female characters. Given that many threats would have occurred from same sex individuals within one’s own species, this fares well for the claim that dreams are for threat perception and rehearsal, but not for courtship rituals that could help pass on the trait. There are ways around this objection, however. Threatening and sexual encounters are such polar opposites that different parts of the nervous system deal with them – the sympathetic and parasympathetic – dramatically alternating between the two could potentially disrupt sleep. Clearly, simply surviving is prioritized over reproducing.

5. Dreaming in Contemporary Philosophy of Mind and Consciousness

a. Should Dreaming Be a Scientific Model?

Visual awareness has been used as the model system in consciousness research. It is easy to manipulate and investigate. Humans are predominantly visual creatures and so visual awareness is an excellent paradigm of conscious experience, at least for humans. A good example of the virtues of using paradigm cases to study, from biological science, is drosophila melanogaster (the common fruit fly). This organism is often used in experiments and routinely cited in papers detailing experiments or suggesting further research. A scientific model is a practical necessity and the fruit fly has such a fast reproduction rate that it allows geneticists to see the effects of genes over many generations that they would not see in their own lifetime in, say, humans. The fruit fly also has enough genetic similarity to humans such that the findings can be extrapolated. Hence, a model system has something special about it – some ideal set of features for empirically investigating. Model systems are good because they ideally also display the phenomena being investigated in an “exceptionally prominent form” (Revonsuo, 2006: p.73-74).

i. Dreaming as a Model of Consciousness

Revonsuo (2006) argues that dreaming should also have a place alongside visual awareness, as a special instance of consciousness and therefore a worthy model to be studied. Revonsuo argues that the dreaming brain also captures consciousness in a “theoretically interesting form” (Revonsuo, 2006: p.73). The claim is that dreaming is an unusually rare example of “pure” consciousness, being as it is devoid of ongoing perceptual input and therefore might deserve special status in being scientifically investigated. The system is entirely dependent on internal resources (Metzinger, 2003: p.255) and is isolated from the external world. Representational content changes much quicker than in the waking state, and this is why Metzinger claims that dreams are more dynamic (Metzinger, 2003: p.255). Whereas Malcolm and Dennett had argued that dreams are not even plausibly conscious states, Revonsuo and Metzinger argue that dreams may reveal the very essence of consciousness because of the conditions under which dream consciousness takes place. Crucially, there is a blockade of sensory input. Only very rarely will sensory input contribute to information processing during dreaming, (Metzinger, 2003: p.257) for example in dreams where the sound of the alarm clock is interwoven into a narrative involving wedding bells. This means that most other dreams are “epistemically empty” with regard to the external environment. At no other time is consciousness completely out of synch with the environment, and, so to speak, left to its own devices. Dreaming is especially interesting and fundamentally similar to waking consciousness because it entails consciousness of a world which we take to be the real one, just as we do during waking consciousness. “Only rarely do we realize during the dream that it is only a dream. The estimated frequency of lucid dreams varies in different studies. Approximately 1 to 10% of dream reports include the lucidity and about 60% of the population have experienced a lucid dream at least once in their lifetime (Farthing, 1992; Snyder & Gackenbach, 1988). Thus, as many as 90 to 99% of dreams are completely non-lucid, so that the dream world is taken for real by the dreamer” (Revonsuo, 2006: p.83).

Revonsuo does not so much argue for the displacement of visual awareness qua a model system, as arguing that dreaming is another exemplary token of consciousness. Dreaming, unlike visual awareness, is both untainted by the external world and behavioural activity (Revonsuo, 2006: p.75). Dreams also reveal the especially subjective nature of consciousness: the creation of a “world-for-me”.

Another reason that might motivate modelling dreaming is that it might turn out to be a good instance for looking at the problem of localization in consciousness research. For example, during dreaming the phenomenology is demonstrably not ontologically dependent on any process missing during dreaming. Any parts of the brain not used in dreaming can be ruled out as not being necessary to phenomenal consciousness (Revonsuo, 2006: p.87).

During dreams there is an output blockade (Revonsuo, 2006: p.87; Metzinger, 2003: p.257), making dreaming an especially pure and isolated system. Malcolm had argued that dreaming was worthy of no further empirical work for the notion was simply incoherent, and Dennett was sceptical that dreams would turn out to even involve consciousness. The radical proposal now is that dreaming ought to be championed as an example of conscious experience, a mascot for scientific investigation in consciousness studies. It is alleged that dreams can recapitulate any experience from waking life and for this reason Revonsuo concludes that the same physical or neural realization of consciousness is instantiated in both examples of dreaming and waking experience (Revonsuo, 2006: p.86).

ii. Dreaming as a Contrast Case for Waking Consciousness

The argument of Windt & Noreika (2011) firstly lays out the alleged myriad of problems with taking dreaming as a scientific model in consciousness research and then proposes positive suggestions for the role dreaming can play in consciousness studies. They reject dreaming as a model system but suggest it will work better as a contrast system to wakefulness. The first major problem with using dreaming as a model of consciousness is that, whilst, for example, in biology everybody knows what the fruit fly is, there are a number of different conceptions and debates surrounding key features and claims about dreaming. Hence there is no accepted definition of dreaming (Windt, 2010: p.296). Taking dreaming as a model system of course requires and depends upon exactly what dreaming is characterized as. Revonsuo simply assumes his conception of dreaming is correct. He believes that dreaming can be a model of waking consciousness because dreams can be identical replicas of waking consciousness involving all possible experiences. Windt & Noreika believe that dreams tend to be different to waking life in important ways.

There are further problems with modelling dreams. Collecting dream reports in the laboratory might amount to about five reported dreams a night. This is not practical at all compared to visual awareness where hundreds of reportable experiences can occur in minutes without interference (Windt & Noreika, 2011: p.1099). Scientists do not even directly work with dreams themselves, but rather descriptions of dreams. There is also the added possibility of narrative fabrication (the difference between dream experience and dream report). During the dream itself, it is known that we do not have clarity of awareness as in waking life and we do have a poor memory during the dream experience. Though lucid dreaming is an exception to this rule, it differs from ordinary dreaming and lucid dreaming has not been proposed as a model. The laboratory is needed to control and measure the phenomenon properly but this in itself can influence the dream content and report and so the observer effect and interviewer biases are introduced.

It is not clear that these are insurmountable methodological problems. It might be very difficult to investigate dreams but this comes with the territory of trying to investigate isolated consciousness. Revonsuo is also not suggesting removing visual awareness as the paradigm model, only that dreaming ought to be alongside it. The fact remains, however, that despite suggestions from Revonsuo and others, dreaming being used as a model has simply not yet taken place (Windt & Noreika, 2011: p.1091), regardless of the theoretical incentives.

The problems with the modelling approach point us toward the more modest contrast analysis approach. Windt & Noreika argue that the contrast analysis of dreaming with other wake states should at least be the first step in scientific investigation, even if we wanted to establish what ought to be a model in consciousness research (Windt, 2011: p.1102). What are the reasons for endorsing the positive proposal of using dreams in a contrast analysis with waking life? Though waking consciousness is the default mode through which individuals experience the world, dreaming is the second global state of consciousness. As displayed in reports, dreams involve features which are markedly different to that of waking life – bizarreness and confabulation being key hallmarks of dreaming but not waking consciousness. The two states of waking and dreaming are mediated by radically different neurochemical systems. During wakefulness, the aminergic system is predominantly in control and for dreaming the cholinergic system takes over (Hobson, 1994: pp. 14-15; Hobson, 2005: p.143). This fundamental difference offers an opportunity to examine the neurology and neurochemistry that underpins both states of consciousness. The contrast analysis does not ignore dreaming, but proposes a more modest approach. With research divided between waking consciousness, dreaming and a comparison of the two states, this more practical approach will yield better results, so Windt and Noreika argue. By using the proposed method, we can see how consciousness works both with and without environmental input. Surely both are as equally important as each other, rather than trying to find reason to privilege one over the other. After all, both are genuine examples of consciousness. This approach also means that the outcome will be mutually informative as regards the two types of consciousness with insights gained in both directions. It is important to compare dreaming as an important example of consciousness operating with radically changed neural processing to waking consciousness (Windt & Noreika, 2011: p.1101). With the contrastive analysis there is the prospect of comparing dream consciousness to both pathological and non-pathology waking states, and there is thereby the promise of better understanding how waking consciousness works and how it can also malfunction. We spend about a tenth of our conscious lives dreaming, and yet it is one of the most difficult mental states to scientifically investigate. The contrast analysis is put forward as a possible solution to the problem of how to integrate dreams into consciousness studies. Windt and Noreika add the further proposal that dreams can be more specifically contrasted with pathological, non-pathological and altered states of consciousness. Unlike the modelling option, the contrast analysis seems to be how dreams have been hitherto investigated and so has already proven to be a viable option. This should not definitively preclude the modelling option, however. Perhaps modelling dreams really would be ideal simply because it involves isolated consciousness and the practicality concerns may be overcome in the future.

It remains the case that “one of the central desiderata in the field of empirical dream research is a commonly accepted definition of dreaming” (Windt, 2010: p.296). There are also examples of consciousness at the periphery of sleep that makes it difficult to delineate the boundaries of what does and does not count as a dream (Mavromatis, 1987: p.3; ‘hypnagogic’ experiences are the thoughts, images or quasi-hallucinations that occur prior to and during sleep onset whilst ‘hypnopompic’ experiences are thoughts, images or quasi-hallucinations that occur during or just after waking; these states are now known collectively as hypnagogia). This is a problem that both the modelling and the contrast analysis approach both must confront.

b. Is Dreaming an Instance of Images or Percepts?

Some believe that dreaming involves mental imagery of both hallucinatory and imagistic nature (Symons: 1993: p.185; Seligman & Yellen, 1987). However, other philosophers such as Colin McGinn believe that dreams should only be thought of in terms of images (the imagination) or percepts (perceptual experience). It is better to not inflate our ontology and invoke a third category that dreams are sui generis (of their own kind) if we do not need to. There are reasons why we should not believe dreams are a unique mental state. It would be strange, McGinn claims, if “the faculties recruited in dreaming were not already exploited during waking life” (McGinn, 2004: p.75). So he believes that dreaming is an instance of a psychological state we are already familiar with from waking life: perception (hallucination) or the imagination. There is a separate epistemic question of whether dreams involve beliefs or imaginings (Ichikawa, 2009). This debate comes apart from the psychological one as to whether the phenomenology of dreaming is percept or imagining because all four possible combinations can be held: A theorist might claim that dreams are hallucination which involve belief; another theorist might claim that dreams involve hallucinations which we do not generate belief, but we are rather always entertaining our dream hallucinations as imagined possibilities. Alternatively, dreams might involve the psychological state of the imagination and yet we happen to believe in our imaginings as though they were real; finally, dreams might involve imaginings which we recognize as such, imaginings and not beliefs. Though the two debates come apart, in waking life the psychological state of imagining is usually accompanied by the propositional attitude of imagining that something is the case, rather than believing that the something (psychologically imagined) is the case. Perception, or hallucination, usually triggers belief that what is perceived is the case, rather than merely imagining that what is perceived is the case. So if dreams are psychologically defined in terms of percepts, we can expect that dreams likely also involve belief because percepts usually trigger belief. This is not always the case, however. For example, a schizophrenic might come to realize that his hallucinations do not really express a way the world is and so no longer believe what he perceives. If dreams are propositionally imagined, then we would usually expect our imaginings to be recognized as not being real and therefore triggering the propositional attitude of imagining rather than believing that what we are imaging (in the psychological sense) that something is the case. There are more nuanced views than the four possible combinations. McGinn claims that dreaming involves the imagination and quasi-belief. When we dream we are immersed in the fictional plot, as we are in creative writing or film.

i. Dreaming as Hallucination

It is worth noting that the psychological literature assumes that dreams are hallucinations that occur during sleep. It is the typically unquestioned psychological orthodoxy that dreams are perceptual/ hallucinatory experiences. Evidence can be cited for dreams as percepts from neuroscience:

The offline world simulation engages the same brain mechanisms as perceptual consciousness and seems real to us because we are unaware that it is nothing but a hallucination (except very rarely in lucid dreams). (Valli & Revonsuo, 2009: p.19)

In REM sleep, when we are lying still due to muscle paralysis, the motor programs of the brain are nonetheless active. Phenomenologically, our dream selves are also highly active during dreams. As the content of a dream reveals, we are always on the move. Apart from the bodily paralysis, physiologically the body acts as though it perceives a real world, and continually reacting to events in that apparently real world. It is known that individuals will carry out their dream actions if the nerve cells that suppress movement are surgically removed or have deteriorated due to age, as demonstrated in people with REM Sleep Behavior Disorder. This suggests that dreaming involves the ordinary notion of belief because it is tied to action in the usual way and it is only because of an additional action-suppressing part of the brain that these actions are not carried out. We know that percepts ordinarily trigger belief and corresponding action, whereas the imagination does not.

The claim that dreams are hallucinations can find support in the further claim that dreaming replicates waking consciousness. Many philosophers and psychologists make note of the realistic and organized nature of dreams, and this has been couched in terms of a virtual reality, involving a realistic representation of the bodily self which we can feel. Consider false awakenings, where an individual believes they have woken up in the very place they went to sleep, yet they are actually still asleep in dreaming. False awakenings can arguably be used in support of the view that dreaming is hallucinatory because such dreams detail a realistic depiction of one’s surroundings. Dreams fit the philosophical concept of hallucination as an experience intrinsically similar to legitimate perceptual states with the difference that the apparent stimulus being perceived is non-existent (Windt, 2010: pp. 298-299). It is the job of perceptual states to display the self in a world.

Empirical evidence suggests that pain can be experienced in dreams, which is perceptual in nature and which the imagination can arguably not replicate. So dreams must be hallucinatory, according to this line of reasoning. It is not clear though whether this rules out dreams as mainly imaginative with occasional perceptual elements introduced. Pain is, after all, a rarity in dreaming.

We can plausibly speculate that human ancestors fell prey to a major metaphysical confusion and thought that their dreams involved genuine experiences in the past, including visitations from the dead and entering a different realm. Though few believe this today, we can sympathize with our ancestors’ mistake which is further supported by the occasional everyday feeling where we can be hesitant to categorize a memory of an experience as a dream or a waking event. We usually decide, not based on introspection, but on logical discrepancies between the memory and other factors. These two reasons suggest that we cannot always easily distinguish between dream experience and waking experience, because they are another instance of percepts.

Finally, we seem to have real emotions during dreams which are the natural reaction to our perceptions. According to the percept view of dreams, we dream that we are carrying actions out in an environment, but our accompanying emotions are not dreamed and play out alongside the rest of the dream content. The intensity of the emotions, actually felt, is what the percept theorist will take as support for the content of the dream not being merely imagined, but the natural response of realistic, perceptual-like experience.

ii. Dreaming as Imagination

A number of philosophers believe that dreaming is just the imagination at work during sleep (Ichikawa, 2008; Sosa, 2007; McGinn, 2004, 2005). Any conscious experiences during sleep are imagistic rather than perceptual. McGinn puts forward some reasons in favour of believing that dreams are imaginings. Firstly, he introduces The Observational Attitude: if we are perceiving (or hallucinating), say, two individuals having a conversation then we might need to strain our senses to hear or see what they are discussing. During dreams of course, the body is completely relaxed and the sleeping individual shows no interest in his or her surroundings. When imagining in waking life, I try to minimize my sensory awareness of the surrounding environment in order to get a better and more vivid picture of what it is I am imagining. For example, if I want to imagine a new musical tune, I do best to switch the radio off or cover my ears. Dreaming is the natural instance of shutting out all of our sensory awareness of the outside world, arguably to entirely engage the imagination. This suggests that the dreamer is hearing with their mind’s ear and seeing with their mind’s eye. They are entertaining images, not percepts. Secondly, McGinn claims that percepts and images can coexist in the mind in waking life. We can perceive at the same time as imagining. The novel presupposes that the reader can perceive the text at the same time as imagining its content. It ought to be possible, McGinn argues, that if dreams are hallucinatory, we should be able to imagine at the same time. If I am surfing in a dream, I should be able to imagine the Eiffel tower at the same time. In dreams we cannot do this, there is just the dream, McGinn claims, with no further ability to simultaneously imagine other content. Related to the Observational Stance is the notion of Recognition in dreams. In dreams we seem to already know who all of the characters are, without making any effort to find out who they are (without using any of our senses). This might suggest that in dreams we are partly in control of the content (even if we fail to realize it) because we allegedly summon up the characters that we want to. We recognize who dream characters are, such as relatives, even when they look drastically different. It is not clear, on the other hand, that we really are in control of other dream characters and that we accurately recognize them, for example, Gerrans (2012) has claimed that the same mechanism of misidentification is present in dreams as in certain delusional states where the feeling of familiarity of a person is over-active and aimed at the wrong individuals (as in Fregoli delusion). On this view, we do not accurately bring to mind certain dream characters, we try to identify them and make mistakes. This would be an alternative way of accommodating the evidence.

In the 1940’s and 1950’s, a survey found that a majority of Americans thought that their own dreams, and dreams more generally, occurred in black and white. Crucially, people have thought prior to and after this period that dreams occur in colour. This period coincided with the advent of black and white television. According to Schwitzgebel, the most reasonable conclusion to draw is that dreams are more like imagining written fiction, sketchy and without any colour; I can read a novel without summoning any definite imagery to mind (Schwitzgebel, 2002: p.656). Perhaps this is akin to reading a novel quickly and forming vague and indefinite imagery. Ichikawa also argues that dreaming involves only images and is indeterminate to colour because images can be indeterminate to colour, but to hallucinate would require some determinacy in colour, whether black and white or in full colour Crucially, even outside of Schwitzgebel’s findings, people have raised the question whether we dream in colour or black and white – something needs to explain the very possibility of such a dispute; “the imagination model may provide the best explanation for disagreement about colour sensation in dreams”  (Ichikawa, 2009: p.109). McGinn also believes that dreams can be indeterminate to colour, and they can be coloured in during the waking report, which can be affected by the current media.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, R. (1985) “Involuntary Sins,” The Philosophical Review, Vol. 94, No. 1 (Jan., 1985), pp. 3 – 31.
  • Antrobus, J. S., Antrobus, J. S. & Fisher, C. (1965) “Discrimination of Dreaming and Nondreaming Sleep,” Archives of General Psychiatry 12: pp. 395 – 401.
  • Antrobus, J. (2000) “How Does the Dreaming Brain Explain the Dreaming Mind?” Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 23 (6): pp. 904 – 907.
  • Arikin, A. Antrobus, J. & Ellman, S. (1978) The Mind in Sleep: Psychology and Physiology New Jersey: Lawrence Erlbaum.
  • St. Augustine (398) Confessions in Great Books of the Western World |16 translated by R. S. Pine-Coffin, Chicago: Britannica, 1994.
    • In this historical canon of philosophy, Augustine discusses and comes to the conclusion that we are not immoral in our dreams, though it appears as though we sin.
  • Ayer, A. (1960) “Professor Malcolm on Dreams,” The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. 57, No. 16 (Aug. 4, 1960), pp. 517 - 535.
    • Ayer’s first reply to Malcolm’s thesis against the received view – part of a heated back and forth exchange that borders on the ad hominem.
  • Ayer, A. (1961) “Rejoinder to Professor Malcolm,” The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. 58, No. 11 (May 25, 1961), pp. 297 - 299.
  • Baghdoyan, H. A., Rodrigo-Angulo, M. L., McCarley, R. W. & Hobson, J. A. (1987) “A Neuroanatomical Gradient in the Pontine Tegmentum for the Cholinoceptive Induction of Desynchronized Sleep Signs,” Brain Research 414: pp. 245 – 61.
  • Bakeland, F. (1971) “Effects of Pre-sleep Procedures and Cognitive Style on Dream Content,” Perceptual and Motor Skills 32:63–69.
  • Bakeland, F., Resch, R. & Katz, D. D. (1968) “Pre-sleep Mentation and Dream Reports,” Archives of General Psychiatry 19: pp. 300 – 11.
  • Ballantyne, N. & Evans, E. (2010) “Sosa’s Dream,” Philos Stud (2010) 148: pp. 249 – 252.
  • Barrett, D. (1992) “Just How Lucid are Lucid Dreams?” Dreaming 2: pp. 221 – 28.
  • Berger, R. J. (1967) “When is a Dream is a Dream is a Dream?” Experimental Neurology (Supplement) 4:15–27.
  • Blackmore, S (1991) “Lucid Dreaming: Awake in your Sleep?” Skeptical Inquirer, 15, pp. 362 – 370.
  • Blackmore, S. (2004) Consciousness: An Introduction Oxford: OUP.
  • Blackmore, S. (2005) Consciousness: A Very Short Introduction Oxford: OUP.
    • Chapter 7, “Altered States of Consciousness,” looks at dreams and sleep and considers a “retro-selection theory of dreams” in reference to Dennett’s model of unconsciously dreaming.
  • Blaustein, J., (Eds.) Handbook of Neurochemistry and Molecular Neurobiology, 3rd Edition: Behavioral Neurochemistry and Neuroendocrinology New York: Springer Science, 2007.
    • Contains useful, but advanced, information on the neurochemistry involved during processes of sleep and waking.
  • Brown, J. (2009) “Sosa on Skepticism” Philosophy Studies.
  • Canfield, J. (1961) “Judgements in Sleep,” The Philosophical Review, Vol. 70, No. 2 (Apr., 1961), pp. 224 - 230.
  • Candlish, S. & Wrisley, G. (2012) “Private Language,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Chappell, V. (1963) “The Concept of Dreaming,” Philosophical Quarterly, 13 (July): pp. 193 -  213.
  • Child, W. (2007) “Dreaming, Calculating, Thinking: Wittgenstein and Anti-Realism about the Past” The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 57, No. 227 (Apr., 2007), pp. 252-272.
  • Child, W. (2009) “Wittgenstein, Dreaming and Anti-Realism: A Reply to Richard Scheer,”Philosophical Investigations 32:4 October 2009, pp. 229 - 337.
  • Cicogna, P. & Bosinelli, M. (2001) “Consciousness during Dreams,” Consciousness and Cognition 10, pp. 26 – 41.
  • Cioffi, F. (2009) “Making the Unconscious Conscious: Wittgenstein versus Freud,” Philosophia, 37: pp. 565 – 588.
  • Cohen, D., “Sweet Dreams,” New Scientist, Issue 2390, p. 50.
  • Dawkins, R. (1998) Unweaving the Rainbow: Science, Delusion and the Appetite for Wonder London: Penguin, p. 158.
    • Dawkins briefly considers the phenomenon of purported dream prophecy and the relationship between coincidence and reporting, something he also discusses in The Magic of Reality (2011).
  • Dennett, D. (1976) “Are Dreams Experiences?” The Philosophical Review, Vol. 85, No. 2 (Apr., 1976), pp. 151-171.
    • This is the seminal paper by Dennett in which he advances the claim that dreams might not be experiences that occur during sleep.
  • Dennett, D. (1979) “The Onus Re Experiences: A Reply to Emmett,” Philosophical Studies 35: pp. 315 - 318.
  • Dennett, D. (1991) Consciousness Explained London: Penguin.
  • Descartes, R. (1641) Meditations on First Philosophy in Great Books of the Western World 28 Chicago: Britannica, 1994.
  • Domhoff, G. & Kamiya, J. (1964) “Problems in Dream Content Study with Objective Indicators: I. A Comparison of Home and Laboratory Dream Reports,” Archives of General Psychiatry 11: pp. 519 – 24.
  • Doricchi, F. et al (2007) “The “Ways” We Look at Dreams: Evidence from Unilateral Spatial Neglect (with an evolutionary account of dream bizarreness)” Exp Brain Res (2007) 178: pp. 450 – 461.
  • Driver, J. (2007) “Dream Immorality,” Philosophy, Vol. 82, No. 319 (Jan., 2007), pp. 5 – 22.
  • Emmett, K. (1978) “Oneiric Experiences,” Philosophical Studies, 34 (1978): pp. 445 - 450.
  • Empson, J. (1989) Sleep and Dreaming Hempstead: Harvester Wheatsheaf.
  • Farthing, W. (1992) The Psychology of Consciousness New York: Prentice Hall.
  • Flanagan, O. (1995) “Deconstructing Dreams: The Spandrels of Sleep,” Journal of Philosophy, 92, no. 1 (1995): pp. 5 – 27.
  • Flanagan, O. (2000) Dreaming Souls: Sleep, Dreams and the Evolution of the Conscious Mind  Oxford: OUP.
    • This rare book-length treatment of philosophical issues about dreaming is also devoted to arguing that dreams are by-products of sleep.
  • Flowers, L. & Delaney, G. (2003) “Dream Therapy,” in Encyclopedia of Neurological Sciences, Elsevier Science USA: pp. 40 - 44.
  • Foulkes, D. (1999) Children’s Dreaming and the Development of Consciousness Harvard.
  • Freud, S. (1900) The Interpretation of Dreams in Great Books of the Western World 54 Chicago: Britannica, 1994.
  • Gendler, T. (2011) “Imagination,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Gerrans, P. (2012) “Dream Experience and a Revisionist Account of Delusions of Misidentification,” Consciousness and Cognition, 21 (2012) pp. 217 – 227.
    • This paper is primarily about delusions that involve misidentifying individuals, such as Fregoli delusion, and alleges that dreams contain similar delusional features.
  • Ghosh, P. (2010) “Dream Recording Device ‘Possible’ Researcher Claims,” BBC News.
  • Gould, S. & Lewontin, R. (1979) “The Spandrels of San Marco and the Panglossian Paradigm: a Critique of the Adaptationist Programme” Proceedings of the Royal Society of London, B 205, pp. 581 – 598.
  • Green, C. (1968) Lucid Dreams Oxford: Institute of Psychophysical Research.
  • Green, C. & McCreery, C. (1994) Lucid Dreaming: The Paradox of Consciousness During Sleep Philadelphia: Routledge, 2001.
  • Greenberg, M. & Farah, M. (1986) “The Laterality of Dreaming,” Brain and Cognition, 5, pp. 307 – 321.
  • Gunderson K (2000) “The Dramaturgy of Dreams in Pleistocene Minds and Our Own,” Behavioral and Brain Sciences 23(6), pp. 946 – 947.
  • Hacking, I. (1975) “Norman Malcolm’s Dreams,” in Why Does Language Matter toPhilosophy Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hacking, I. (2001) “Dreams in Place,” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, Vol. 59, No. 3 (Summer, 2001): pp. 245 – 260.
  • Hill, J. (2004a) “The Philosophy of Sleep: The Views of Descartes, Locke and Leibniz,” Richmond Journal of Philosophy, Spring.
  • Hill, J. (2004b) “Descartes’ Dreaming Argument and Why We Might Be Skeptical of It,” Richmond Journal of Philosophy, Winter.
  • Hill, J. (2006) “Meditating with Descartes,” Richmond Journal of Philosophy, Spring.
  • Hobbes, T. (1651) Leviathan in Great Books of the Western World | 21 Chicago: Britannica, 1994.
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    • J. Allan Hobson is an authoritative source on the psychology of sleep and dreaming.
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Author Information

Ben Springett
Email: bs1844@my.bristol.ac.uk
University of Bristol
United Kingdom

Mou Zongsan

Mou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san) (1909—1995)

Mou ZongsanMou Zongsan (Mou Tsung-san) is a sophisticated and systematic example of a modern Chinese philosopher. A Chinese nationalist, he aimed to reinvigorate traditional Chinese philosophy through an encounter with Western (and especially German) philosophy and to restore it to a position of prestige in the world. In particular, he engaged closely with Immanuel Kant’s three Critiques and attempted to show, pace Kant, that human beings possess intellectual intuition, a supra-sensible mode of knowledge that Kant reserved to God alone. He assimilated this notion of intellectual intuition to ideas found in Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism and attempted to expand it into a metaphysical system that would establish the objectivity of moral values and the possibility of sagehood.

Mou’s Collected Works run to thirty-three volumes and extend to history of philosophy, logic, epistemology, ontology, metaethics, philosophy of history, and political philosophy.  His corpus is an unusual hybrid in that although its main aim is to erect a metaphysical system, many of the books where Mou pursues that end consist largely of cultural criticism or histories of Confucian, Buddhist, or Daoist philosophy in which Mou explains his own opinions through exegesis of other thinkers’ in a terminology appropriated from Kant, Tiantai Buddhism, and Neo-Confucianism.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Cultural Thought
    1. Chinese Philosophy and the Chinese Nation
    2. Development of Chinese Philosophy
    3. History of Chinese Philosophy: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism
  3. Metaphysical Thought
    1. Intellectual Intuition and Things-in-Themselves
    2. Two-Level Ontology
    3. Perfect Teaching
  4. Criticisms
  5. Influence
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Mou was born in 1909, at the very end of China’s imperial era, into the family of a rural innkeeper who admired Chinese classical learning, which the young Mou came to share. At just that time, however, traditional Chinese learning was being denigrated by some of the intellectual elite, who searched frantically for something to replace it due to fears that their own tradition was dangerously impotent against modern nation-states armed with Western science, technology, bureaucracy, and finance.

In 1929, Mou enrolled in Peking (Beijing) University’s department of philosophy. He embarked on a deep study of Russell and Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica (then a subject of great interest in Chinese philosophical circles ) and also of Whitehead’s Process and Reality. However, Mou was also led by his interest in Whiteheadian process thought to read voraciously in the pre-modern literature on the Yijing (I Ching or Book of Changes), and his classical tastes made him an oddball at Peking University, which was vigorously modernist and anti-traditional.  Mou would have been a lonely figure there had he not met Xiong Shili in his junior year. Xiong was just making his name as a nationally known apologist for traditional Chinese philosophy and mentored Mou for years afterward.   The two men remained close until Mou later left the mainland. Mou graduated from Peking University in 1933 and moved around the country unhappily from one short-term teaching job to another owing to frequent workplace personality conflicts and fighting between the Chinese government and both Japanese and Communist forces. Despite these peregrinations, Mou wrote copiously on logic and epistemology and also on the Yijing.  Mou hated the Communists very boisterously and when they took over China in 1949 he moved to Taiwan and spent the next decade teaching and writing in a philosophical vein about the history and future of Chinese political thought and culture. In 1960, once again unhappy with his colleagues, Mou was invited by his friend Tang Junyi, also a student of Xiong, to leave Taiwan for academic employment in Hong Kong.  There, Mou’s work took a decisive turn and entered what he later considered its mature stage, yielding the books which established him as a key figure in modern Chinese philosophy. During the next thirty-five years he published seven major monographs (one running to three volumes), together with translations of all three of Immanuel Kant’s Critiques and many more volumes’ worth of articles, lectures, and occasional writings. Mou officially retired from the Chinese University of Hong Kong in 1974 but continued to teach and lecture in Hong Kong and Taiwan until his death in 1995.

We can divide Mou’s expansive thought into two closely related parts which we might call his “cultural” thought, about the history and destiny of Chinese culture, and his “metaphysical” thought, concerning the problems and doctrines of Chinese philosophy, which Mou thought of as the essence of Chinese culture.

2. Cultural Thought

a. Chinese Philosophy and the Chinese Nation

Like most intellectuals of his generation, Mou was a nationalist and saw his work as a way to strengthen the Chinese nation and return it to a place of greatness in the world.

Influenced by Hegel, Mou thought of the history and culture of the Chinese nation as an organic whole,, with a natural and knowable course of development. He thought that China’s political destiny depended ultimately on its philosophy, and in turn blamed China’s conquest by the Manchus in 1644, and again by the Communists in 1949, on its loss of focus on the Neo-Confucianism of the Song through Ming dynasties (960-1644)He hoped his own work would help to re-kindle China’s commitment to Confucianism and thereby help defeat Communism.

Along with many of his contemporaries, Mou was interested in why China never gave rise its own Scientific Revolution like that in the West, and also in articulating what the strengths were in China’s intellectual history whereby it outstripped the West. Mou phrased his answer to these two questions in terms of “inner sagehood” (neisheng) and “outer kingship” (waiwang). By “inner sagehood,” Mou meant the cultivation of moral conduct and outlook—at which he thought Confucianism was unequalled in the world—and he used “outer kingship” to encompass political governancealong with other ingredients in the welfare of society, such as a productive economy and scientific and technological know-how. Mou thought that China’s classical tradition was historically weak in the theory and practice of “outer kingship,” and he believed that Chinese culture would have to transform itself thoroughly by discovering in its indigenous learning the resources with which to develop traditions of science and democracy.

For the last thirty years of his life, all of Mou’s writings were part of a conversation with Immanuel Kant, whom he considered the greatest Western philosopher and the one most useful for exploring Confucian “moral metaphysics.” Throughout that half of his career, Mou’s books quoted Kant extensively (sometimes for pages at a time) and appropriated Kantian terms into the service of his reconstructed Confucianism. Scholars agree widely that Mou altered the meanings of these terms significantly when he moved them from Kant’s system into his own, but opinions vary about just how conscious Mou was that he had done so.

b. Development of Chinese Philosophy

As an apologist for Chinese philosophy, Mou was anxious to show that its genius extended to almost all areas and epochs of Chinese philosophy. To this end, He wrote extensively about the history of Chinese philosophy and highlighted the important contributions of Daoist and Buddhist philosophy, along with their harmonious interaction with Confucian philosophy in the dialectical unfolding and refinement of Chinese philosophy in each age.

Before China was united under the Qin dynasty (221-206 BCE), Mou believed, Chinese culture gave definitive form to the ancient philosophical inheritance of the late Zhou dynasty (771-221 BCE), culminating in the teachings of Confucius and Mencius. These were still epigrammatic rather systematic, but Mou thought that they already contained the essence of later Chinese philosophy in germinal form. The next great phase of development came in the Wei-Jin period (265-420 CE) with the assimilation of “Neo-Daoism” or xuanxue (literally “dark” or “mysterious learning”), from whence came the first formal articulation of the “perfect teaching” (concerning which see below). Shortly afterward, Mou taught, Chinese culture experienced its first great challenge from abroad, in the form of Buddhist philosophy. In the Sui and Tang dynasties (589-907) it was the task of Chinese philosophy to “digest” or absorb Buddhist philosophy into itself. In the process, it gave birth to indigenous Chinese schools of Buddhist philosophy (most notably Huayan and Tiantai), which Mou believed advanced beyond the Indian schools because they agreed with essential tenets of native Chinese philosophy, such as the teaching that all people are endowed with an innately sagely nature.

On Mou’s account, in the Song through Ming dynasties (960-1644) Confucianism underwent a second great phase of development and reasserted itself as the true and proper leader of Chinese culture and philosophy. However, at the end of the Ming, there occurred what Mou taught was an alien irruption into Chinese history by the Manchus, who thwarted the “natural” course of China’s cultural unfolding. In the thinking of late Ming philosophers such as Huang Zongxi (1610-1695), Gu Yanwu (1613-1682), and Wang Fuzhi (1619-1692), Mou thought that China had been poised to give rise to its own new forms of “outer kingship” which would have eventuated in an indigenous birth of science and democracy in China, enabling China to compete with the modern West. Chinese culture, however. was diverted from that healthy course of development by the intrusion of the Manchus. Mou believed that it was this diversion which made China vulnerable to the Communist takeover of the 20th century by alienating it from its own philosophical tradition.

Mou preached that the mission of modern Chinese philosophy was to achieve a mutually beneficial conciliation with Western philosophy. Inspired by the West’s example, China would appropriate science and democracy into its native tradition, and the West in turn would benefit from China’s unparalleled expertise in “inner sagehood,” typified especially by its “perfect teaching.”

However, throughout Mou’s lifetime, he remained unimpressed with the actual state of contemporary Chinese philosophy. He seldom rated any contemporary Chinese thinkers as worthy of the name “philosopher,” and he mentioned Chinese Marxist thought only rarely and only as a force entirely antipathetic to true Chinese philosophy.

c. History of Chinese Philosophy: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism

In his historical writings on Confucianism, Mou is most famous for his thesis of the “three lineages” (san xi). Whereas Neo-Confucians where traditionally grouped into a “School of Principle” represented chiefly by Zhu Xi (1130-1200) and a “School of Mind” associated with Lu Xiangshan (1139-1192) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529), Mou also recognized a third lineage exemplified by lesser-known figures as Hu Hong (Hu Wufeng) (1105-1161) and Liu Jishan (Liu Zongzhou) (1578-1645).

Mou judged this third lineage to be the true representatives of Confucian orthodoxy. He criticized Zhu Xi, conventionally regarded as the authoritative synthesizer of Neo-Confucian doctrine, as a usurper who despite good intentions depicted heavenly principle (tianli) in an excessively transcendent way that was foreign to the ancient Confucian message. On Mou’s view, that message is one of paradoxical “immanent transcendence” (neizai chaoyue), in which heavenly principle and human nature are only lexically distinct from each other, not substantially separate. It was because Mou believed that the Hu-Liu lineage of Neo-Confucianism expressed this paradoxical relationship most accurately and artfully that that he ranked it the highest or “perfect” (yuan) expression of Confucian philosophy. (See “Perfect Teaching” below.)

Because Mou wanted to revalorize the whole Chinese philosophical tradition, and not just its Confucian wing, he also wrote extensively on Chinese Buddhist philosophy. He maintained that Indian Buddhist philosophy had remained limited and flawed until in migrated to Chinawhere it was leavened with what Mou saw as core principles of indigenous Chinese philosophy, such as a belief in the basic goodness of both human nature and the world. From Chinese Buddhist thought he adopted methodological ideas that he later applied to his own system. One of these was “doctrinal classification” (panjiao), a doxographic technique of reading competing philosophical systems as forming a dialectical progression of closer and closer approximations to a “perfect teaching” (yuanjiao), rather than as mutually incompatible contenders. Much as Mou discovered what he thought of as the highest expression of Confucian doctrine in the largely forgotten thinkers of the Hu-Liu lineage, he found what he thought of as their formal analog and philosophical precursor in the relatively obscure Tiantai school of Buddhism and its thesis of the identity of enlightenment and delusion.

Mou wrote far less about Daoism than Confucianism or Buddhism, but at least in principle he regarded it too as an indispensible part of the Chinese philosophical heritage. Mou focused most on the “Inner Chapters” (neipian) of the Zhuangzi, especially the “Wandering Beyond” (Xiaoyao you) and “Discussion on Smoothing Things Out”(Qi wu lun) and the writings of Wei-Jin commentators Guo Xiang (c. 252-312 CE) and Wang Bi (226-249 CE). Mou saw the Wei-Jin idea of “root and traces” (ji ben) in particular as an early forerunner of Tiantai Buddhist thinking central to its concept of the “perfect teaching.”

3. Metaphysical Thought

In his metaphysical writings, Mou was mainly interested in how moral value is able to exist and how people are able to know it. Mou hoped to show that humans can directly know moral value and indeed that such knowledge amounts to knowledge par excellence. In an inversion of one of Kant’s terms, he called this project “moral metaphysics” (daode de xingshangxue), meaning a metaphysics in which moral value is ontically primary. That is, a moral metaphysics considers that the central ontological fact is that moral value exists and is known or “intuited” by us more directly than anything else. Mou believed that Chinese philosophy alone has generated the necessary insights for constructing such a moral metaphysics, whereas Kant (who represented for Mou the summit of Western philosophy) did not understand moral knowing because, fixated on theoretical and speculative knowledge, he wrong-headedly applied the same transcendentalism that Mou found so masterful in the Critique of Pure Reason (which supposes that we know a thing not directly but only through the distorting lenses of our mental apparatus) to moral matters, where it is completely out of place.

a. Intellectual Intuition and Things-in-Themselves

For many, the most striking thing about Mou’s philosophy (and the hardest to accept) is his conviction that human beings possess “intellectual intuition” (zhi de zhijue), a direct knowledge of reality without resort to the senses and without overlaying such sensory forms and cognitive categories as time, space, number, and cause and effect.

As with most of the terms that Mou borrowed from Kant, he attached a much different meaning to ‘intellectual intuition.’   For Kant, intellectual intuition was a capacity belonging to God alone. However, Mou thought this was Kant’s greatest mistake and concluded that one of the great contributions of Chinese philosophy to the world was a unanimous belief that humans have intellectual intuition. In the context of Chinese philosophy he took ‘intellectual intuition’ as an umbrella term for the various Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist concepts of a supra-mundane sort of knowing that, when perfected, makes its possessor a sage or a buddha.

On Mou’s analysis, though Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist philosophers call intellectual intuition by different names and theorize it differently, they agree that it is available to everyone, that it transcends subject-object duality, and that it is higher than, and prior to, the dualistic knowledge which comes through the “sensible intuition” of seeing and hearingoften called “empirical” (jingyan) or “grasping” (zhi) knowledge in Mou’s terminology. However, Mou taught that the Confucian understanding of intellectual intuition (referred to by a variety of names such as ren, “benevolence,” or liangzhi, “innate moral knowing”) is superior to the Buddhist and Daoist conceptions because it recognizes that intellectual intuition is essentially moral and creative.

Mou thought that people regularly manifest intellectual intuition in everyday life in the form of morally correct impulses and behaviors. To use the classic Mencian example, if we see a child about to fall down a well, we immediately feel alarm. For Mou, this sudden upsurge of concern is an occurrence of intellectual intuition, spontaneous and uncaused. Furthermore, Mou endorsed what he saw as the Confucian doctrine that it is this essentially moral intellectual intuition that “creates” or “gives birth to the ten thousand things” (chuangsheng wanwu) by conferring on them moral value.

b. Two-Level Ontology

Through our capacity for intellectual intuition, Mou taught, human beings are “finite yet infinite” (youxian er wuxian). He accepted Kant’s system as a good analysis of our finite aspect, which is to say our experience as beings who are limited in space and time and also in understanding, but he also thought that in our exercise of intellectual intuition we transcend our finitude as well.

Accordingly, Mou went to great pains to explain how the world of sensible objects and the realm of noumenal objects, or objects of intellectual intuition, are related to each other in a “two-level ontology” (liangceng cunyoulun) inspired by the Chinese Buddhist text The Awakening of Faith. In this model, all of reality is said to consist of mind, but a mind which has two aspects (yixin ermen). As intellectual intuition, mind directly knows things-in-themselves, without mediation by forms and categories and without the illusion that things-in-themselves are truly separate from mind. This upper level of the two-level ontology is what Mou labels “ontology without grasping” (wuzhi cunyoulun), once again choosing a term of Buddhist inspiration. However, mind also submits itself to forms and categories in a process that Mou calls “self-negation” (ziwo kanxian). Mind at this lower level, which Mou terms the “cognitive mind” (renzhi xin), employs sensory intuition and associated cognitive processes to apprehend things as discrete objects, separate from each other and from mindhaving location in time and space, numerical identity, and causal and other relations. This lower ontological level is what Mou calls “ontology with grasping” (zhi de cunyoulun).

c. Perfect Teaching

On Mou’s view, all of the many types of Chinese philosophy he studied taught some version of this doctrine of intellectual intuition, things-in-themselves, and phenomena, and he considered it important to explain how he adjudicated among these many broadly similar strains of philosophy. To that end, he borrowed from Chinese Buddhist scholasticism the concept of a “perfect teaching” (yuanjiao) and the practice of classifying teachings (panjiao) doxographically in order to rank them from less to more “perfect” or complete.

A perfect teaching, in Mou’s sense of the term, is distinguished from a penultimate one not by its content (which is the same in either case) but by its rhetorical form. Specifically, a perfect teaching is couched in the form of a paradox (guijue). In Mou’s opinion, all good examples of Chinese philosophy acknowledge the commonsense difference between subject and object but also teach that we can transcend that difference through the exercise of intellectual intuition. But what distinguishes a perfect teaching is that it makes a show of flatly asserting, in a way supposed to surprise the listener, that subject and object are simply identical to one another, without qualification.

Mou developed this formal concept of a perfect teaching from the example offered by Tiantai Buddhist philosophyHe then applied it to the history of Confucian thoughtidentifying what he thought of as a Confucian equivalent to the Tiantai perfect teaching in the writings of Cheng Hao (1032-1085), Hu Hong, and Liu Jishan. Though Mou believed that all three families of Confucian philosophy—Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist—had their own versions of a perfect teaching, he rated the Confucian perfect teaching more highly than the Buddhist or Daoist ones, for it gives an account of the “morally creative” character of intellectual intuition, which he thought essential. In the Confucian perfect teaching, he taught, intellectual intuition is said to “morally create” the cosmos in the sense that it gives order to chaos by making moral judgments and thereby endowing everything in existence with moral significance.

Mou claimed that the perfect teaching was a unique feature of Chinese philosophy and reckoned this a valuable contribution to world philosophy because, in his opinion, only a perfect teaching supplied an answer to what he called the problem of the “summum bonum” (yuanshan) or “coincidence of virtue and happiness” (defu yizhi), that is, the problem of how it can be assured that a person of virtue will necessarily be rewarded with happiness. He noted that in Kant’s philosophy (and, in his opinion, throughout the rest of Western philosophy too) there could be no such assurance that virtue would be crowned with happiness except to hope that God would make it so in the afterlife. By contrast, Mou was proud to say, Chinese philosophy provides for this “coincidence of virtue and happiness” without having to posit either a God or an afterlife. The argument for that assurance differed in Confucian, Buddhist, and Daoist versions of the perfect teaching, but in each case it consisted of a doctrine that intellectual intuition (equivalent to “virtue”) necessarily entails the existence of the phenomenal world (which Mou construed as the meaning of “happiness”), without being contingent on God’s intervention in this world or the next or on any condition other than the operation of intellectual intuition, which Mou considered available to all people at all times.

In arguing for the historical absence of such a solution to the problem of the perfect good anywhere outside of China, Mou did acknowledge that Epicurean and Stoic philosophers also tried to establish that virtue resulted in happiness, but he claimed that their explanations only worked by redefining either virtue or happiness in order to reduce its meaning to something analytically entailed by the other. However, some critics have argued that Mou’s alternative commits the same fault by effectively collapsing happiness into virtue.

4. Criticisms

Mou has often been accused of irrationalism due to his doctrine of the direct, supra-sensory intellectual intuition, which states that people can apprehend the deeper reality underlying the mere phenomena that are measured and described by scientific knowledge. Mou has also been ridiculed because he did not so much present positive arguments in favor of his main metaphysical beliefs as propound them as definitive facts, presumably known to him through a privileged access to sagely intuition.

Critics also frequently question the relevance of Mou’s philosophy, both to the Confucian tradition from which he took his inspiration, as well as to Chinese society. They point out that Mou’s thought (as well as that of other inheritors of Xiong Shili’s legacy in general) inhabits a far different social context than the Confucian tradition with which he identifies. With Mou and his generation, Chinese philosophy was detached from its old homes in the traditional schools of classical learning (shuyuan), the Imperial civil service, and monasteries and hermitages, and was transplanted into the new setting of the modern university, with its disciplinary divisions and limited social role. Critics point to this academicization as evidence that, despite Mou’s aspirations to kindle a massive revival of the Confucian spirit in China, his thought risks being little more than a “lost soul,” deracinated and intellectualized. The first problem with this, they claim, is that Mou reduces Confucianism to a philosophy in the modern academic sense and leaves out other important aspects of the pre-modern Confucian cultural system, such as its art, literature, and ritual and its political and career institutions. Second, they claim, because Mou’s brand of Confucianism accents metaphysics so heavily, it remains confined to departments of philosophy and powerless to exert any real influence over Chinese society.

Mou has also been criticized for his explicit essentialism. In keeping with his Hegelian tendency, he presented China as consisting essentially of Chinese culture, and even more particularly with Chinese philosophy, and he claimed in turn that this is epitomized by Confucian philosophy.  Furthermore, he presents the Confucian tradition as consisting essentially of an idiosyncratic-looking list of Confucian thinkers. Opponents complain that even if there were good reasons for Mou to enshrine his handful of favorite Confucians as the very embodiment of all of Chinese culture, this would remain Mou’s opinion and nothing more, a mere interpretation rather than the objective, factual historical insight that Mou claimed it was.

5. Influence

In Mou’s last decades, he began to be recognized together with other prominent students of Xiong Shili as a leader of what came to be called the “New Confucian” (dangdai xin rujia) movement, which aspires to revive and modernize Confucianism as a living spiritual tradition. Through his many influential protégés, Mou achieved great influence over the agenda of contemporary Chinese philosophy.

Two of his early students, Liu Shu-hsien (b. 1934)  and Tu Wei-ming (b. 1940) have been especially active in raising the profile of contemporary Confucianism in English-speaking venues, as has the Canadian-born scholar John Berthrong (b. 1946). Mou’s emphasis on Kant’s transcendental analytic gave new momentum to research on Kant and post-Kantians, particularly in the work of Mou’s student Lee Ming-huei (b. 1953), and his writings on Buddhism lie behind much of the interest in and interpretation of Tiantai philosophy among Chinese scholars. Finally, Mou functions as the main modern influence on, and point of reference for, the intense research on Confucianism among mainland Chinese philosophers today.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Angle, Stephen C. Sagehood: The Contemporary Significance of Neo-Confucian Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Angle, Stephen C. Contemporary Confucian Political Philosophy. Cambridge: Polity, 2012.
  • Asakura, Tomomi. “On Buddhistic Ontology: A Comparative Study of Mou Zongsan and Kyoto School Philosophy.” Philosophy East and West 61/4 (October 2011): 647-678.
  • Berthrong, John. “The Problem of Mind: Mou Tsung-san's Critique of Chu Hsi." Journal of Chinese Religion 10 (1982): 367-394.
  • Berthrong, John. All Under Heaven. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Billioud, Sébastien. “Mou Zongsan's Problem with the Heideggerian Interpretation of Kant.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 33/2 (June 2006): 225-247.
  • Billioud, Sébastien. Thinking through Confucian Modernity: A Study of Mou Zongsan's Moral Metaphysics. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2011.
  • Bresciani, Umberto. Reinventing Confucianism: The New Confucian Movement. Taipei: Taipei Ricci Institute for Chinese Studies, 2001.
  • Bunnin, Nicholas. “God's Knowledge and Ours: Kant and Mou Zongsan on Intellectual Intuition.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 35/4 (December 2008): 613-624.
  • Chan, N. Serina. “What is Confucian and New about the Thought of Mou Zongsan?” in New Confucianism: A Critical Examination, ed. John Makeham (New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2003), 131-164.
  • Chan, N. Serina. The Thought of Mou Zongsan. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2011.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “Mou Zongsan on Zen Buddhism.” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 5/1 (2005) : 73-88.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “Mou Zongsan's Transformation of Kant's Philosophy.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 33/1 (March 2006): 125-139.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “Mou Zongsan and Tang Junyi on Zhang Zai's and Wang Fuzhi's Philosophies of Qi : A Critical Reflection.” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 10/1 (March 2011): 85-98.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk. “On Mou Zongsan's Hermeneutic Application of Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 174-189.
  • Chan, Wing-Cheuk and Henry C. H. Shiu. “Introduction: Mou Zongsan and Chinese Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 169-173.
  • Clower, Jason. The Unlikely Buddhologist: Tiantai Buddhism in the New Confucianism of Mou Zongsan. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2010.
  • Clower, Jason. “Mou Zongsan on the Five Periods of the Buddha's Teaching. Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 190-205.
  • Guo Qiyong. “Mou Zongsan’s View of Interpreting Confucianism by ‘Moral Autonomy’.” Frontiers of Philosophy in China 2/3 (June 2007): 345-362.
  • Kantor, Hans-Rudolf. “Ontological Indeterminacy and Its Soteriological Relevance: An Assessment of Mou Zongsan's (1909-1995) Interpretation of Zhiyi's (538-597) Tiantai Buddhism.” Philosophy East and West 56/1 (January 2006): 16-68.
  • Kwan, Chun-Keung. “Mou Zongsan’s Ontological Reading of Tiantai Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 206-222.
  • Lin, Chen-kuo. “Dwelling in Nearness to the Gods: The Hermeneutical Turn from MOU Zongsan to TU Weiming.” Dao 7 (2008): 381-392.
  • Lin, Tongqi and Zhou Qin. “The Dynamism and Tension in the Anthropocosmic Vision of Mou Zongsan.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 22/4 (December 1995): 401-440.
  • Liu, Shu-hsien. “Mou Tsung-san (Mou Zongsan)” in Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy, ed. A.S. Cua. New York: Routledge, 2003.
  • Mou, Tsung-san [Mou Zongsan]. “The Immediate Successor of Wang Yang-ming: Wang Lung-hsi and his Theory of Ssu-wu.” Philosophy East and West 23/1-2 (1973): 103-120.
  • Neville, Robert C. Boston Confucianism: Portable Tradition in the Late-Modern World. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2000.
  • Stephan Schmidt. “Mou Zongsan, Hegel, and Kant: The Quest for Confucian Modernity.” Philosophy East and West 61/2 (April 2011): 260-302.
  • Shiu, Henry C.H. “Nonsubstantialism of the Awakening of Faith in Mou Zongsan.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 223-237.
  • Tang, Andres Siu-Kwong. “Mou Zongsan’s ‘Transcendental’ Interpretation of Huayan Buddhism.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38/2 (June 2011): 238-256.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. Centrality and Commonality: An Essay on Confucian Religiousness. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1989.
  • Tu, Xiaofei. “Dare to Compare: The Comparative Philosophy of Mou Zongsan.” Kritike 1/2 (December 2007): 24-35.
  • Zheng Jiadong. “Mou Zongsan and the Contemporary Circumstances of the Rujia.” Contemporary Chinese Thought 36/2 (Winter 2004-5): 67-88.
  • Zheng Jiadong. “Between History and Thought: Mou Zongsan and the New Confucianism That Walked Out of History.” Contemporary Chinese Thought 36/2 (Winter 2004-5): 49-66.

Author Information

Jason Clower
Email: jclower@csuchico.edu
California State University, Chico
U. S. A.

Bodin, Jean

Jean Bodin (c. 1529—1596)

bodinThe humanist philosopher and jurist Jean Bodin was one of the most prominent political thinkers of the sixteenth century. His reputation is largely based on his account of sovereignty which he formulated in the Six Books of the Commonwealth. Bodin lived at a time of great upheaval, when France was ravaged by the wars of religion between the Catholics and the Huguenots. He was convinced that peace could be restored only if the sovereign prince was given absolute and indivisible power of the state. Bodin believed that different religions could coexist within the commonwealth. His tolerance in religious matters has often been emphasized. He was also one of the first men to have opposed slavery.

Bodin was extremely erudite, and his works discuss a wide variety of topics, extending from natural philosophy and religion to education, political economy, and historical methodology. Natural philosophy and religion where intimately correlated for Bodin. Furthermore, he sought to reform the judicial system of France, and he formulated one of the earliest versions of the quantitative theory of money. Bodin held a superstitious belief about the existence of angels and demons; his works cover topics such as demonology and witchcraft, and include extensive passages on astrology and numerology.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Career
  2. Method for the Easy Comprehension of History
    1. Methodology for the Study of History
    2. Theory of Climates
  3. The Six Bookes of a Commonweale
    1. Concept of Sovereignty
    2. Definition of Law
    3. Limitations upon the Authority of the Sovereign Prince
    4. Difference between Form of State and Form of Government
    5. The Question of Slavery
  4. Bodin’s Economic Thought
    1. Quantitative Theory of Money
    2. The State’s Finances and the Question of Taxation and Property Rights
  5. Writings Concerning Religion
    1. Colloquium heptaplomeres and the Question of Religious Tolerance
    2. The Question of True Religion and Bodin’s Personal Faith
  6. On Witchcraft
  7. Natural Philosophy
  8. Other Works
    1. Juris universi distributio
    2. Moral Philosophy
    3. Writings on Education
    4. Bodin’s Surviving Correspondence
  9. Influence
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. Modern Editions of Bodin’s works
        1. Collected Works
        2. Individual Works
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Bibliography
      2. Conference Proceedings and Article Collections

1. Life and Career

Jean Bodin’s last will and testament, dated 7th June 1596, states that he was 66 years old when he died. He was therefore born in either 1529 or 1530, the youngest of seven children, four of whom were girls. Bodin’s father, Guillaume Bodin, was a wealthy merchant and a member of the bourgeoisie of Angers. Very little is known of his mother beyond that her name was Catherine Dutertre and that she died before the year 1561.

Bodin joined the Carmelite brotherhood at an early age. Surviving documents tell us that he was released from his vows a few years later. He is known to have studied, and later, taught law at the University of Toulouse during the 1550s. Bodin was unable to obtain a professorship at the university, and this may have driven him away from Toulouse and academic life. During the 1560s, he worked as an advocate at the Parlement of Paris.

Bodin’s first major work, the Method for the Easy Understanding of History (Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem) was published in 1566, the same year that saw the death of his father. Bodin’s most famous work, the Six Books of the Commonwealth (Six livres de la République) was published ten years later, in 1576. In 1570, Bodin was commissioned by the French King Charles IX for the reformation of forest tenures in Normandy. He was at the very heart of French political power in the 1570s – first during the reign of Charles IX and also, after Charles’ death in 1574, during the reign of his brother, Henri III. In 1576, Bodin lost the favor of King Henri III after he opposed, among other things, the king’s fiscal policies during the States General of Blois where Bodin served as representative for the third estate of Vermandois.

Bodin settled in Laon during the last two decades of his life. He had moved there shortly after marrying the widow of a Laon official, Françoise Trouilliart (or Trouillard) in 1576. Bodin sought employment with the Duke of Alençon, the king’s youngest brother. The duke aspired to marry Queen Elizabeth of England. During one of the duke’s trips to London, Bodin accompanied him. In 1582, Bodin followed Alençon to Antwerp, where Alençon sided with the Low Countries in their revolt against Spain. Bodin was appointed Master of Requests and counselor (maître des requêtes et conseiller) to the duke in 1583. He retired from national politics after Alençon’s sudden death in 1584. Following the death of his brother-in-law, Bodin succeeded him in office as procureur du roi, or Chief Public Prosecutor, for Laon in 1587.

Bodin wrote two notable works toward the end of his life; his Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime (Colloquium heptaplomeres de rerum sublimium arcanis abditis) is an engaging dialogue in favor of religious tolerance. Bodin’s main contribution in the field of natural philosophy, the Theater of Nature (Universae naturae theatrum) was first published in 1596, the same year that Bodin died of the plague. He was given a Catholic burial in the Franciscan church of Laon.

2. Method for the Easy Comprehension of History

Bodin’s Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem (Method for the Easy Comprehension of History) was first published in 1566, and revised in 1572. It is Bodin’s first important work and contains many of the ideas that are developed further in his other key systematic works. Some of them are human history, natural history, and divine history, later elaborated in the République, the Theatrum, and the Colloquium heptaplomeres respectively. Bodin’s purpose in writing the Methodus was to expose the art and method to be used in the study of history. His desire to elaborate a system and to synthesize all existing knowledge is easily detectable in the Methodus.

The first four chapters of the Methodus are largely a discussion concerning methodology. History and its different categories are defined in Chapter One. Chapters II and III discuss the order in which historical accounts are to be read, and the correct order for arranging all material. Chapter IV elucidates the choice of historians; it may be considered as an exposition of Bodin’s method for a critical study of history, that the student of history should move from generalized accounts to more detailed narratives. Reading should begin from the earliest times of recorded history and the reader should naturally progress towards more recent times. In order to obtain a thorough comprehension of the whole, certain other subjects – cosmography, geography, chorography, topography and geometry – are to be associated with the study of history. All material should be critically assessed; the background and training of historians must be taken into account, as well as their qualifications.

In order, then, that the truth of the matter may be gleaned from histories, not only in the choice of individual authors but also in reading them we must remember what Aristotle sagely said, that in reading history it is necessary not to believe too much or disbelieve flatly (…)If we agree to everything in every respect, often we shall take true things for false and blunder seriously in administering the state. But if we have no faith at all in history, we can win no assistance from it. (Bodin 1945, 42)

Of the ten chapters that constitute the Methodus, Chapter Six is by far the lengthiest, covering more than a third of the book, and it may be considered as a blueprint for the République. Chapters VII to IX seek to refute erroneous interpretations of history. Bodin’s first rebuttal concerns the myth, based on a biblical prophecy, of the four monarchies or empires as it was emphasized by many German Protestant theologians. Bodin’s second criticism concerns the idea of a golden age (and the superiority of the ancients in comparison with moderns). Furthermore, Bodin refutes the error of those who claim the independent origin of races. The final chapter of the Methodus contains a bibliography of universal history.

a. Methodology for the Study of History

There are three kinds of history, Bodin writes; divine, natural and human. The Methodus is an investigation into the third type, that is, the study of human actions and of the rules that govern them. Science is not concerned with particulars but with universals. Bodin therefore considers as absurd the attempts of jurisconsults to establish principles of universal jurisprudence from Roman decrees or, more generally, from Roman law, thus giving preference to one legal tradition. Roman law concerns the legislation of one particular state – and the laws of particular states are the subject of civil law—and as such change within a brief period of time. The correct study of law necessitates a different approach, one that was already described by Plato: the correct way to establish law and to govern a state is to bring together and compare the legal framework of all the states that have existed, and compile the very best of them. Together with other so-called legal humanists, like Budé, Alciat, and Connan, Bodin held that the proper understanding of universal law could only be obtained by combining the studies of history and law.

Indeed, in history the best part of universal law lies hidden; and what is of great weight and importance for the best appraisal of legislation – the custom of the peoples, and the beginnings, growth, conditions, changes, and decline of all states – are obtained from it. The chief subject matter of this Method consists of these facts, since no rewards of history are more ample than those usually gathered around the governmental form of states. (Bodin 1945, 8)

Bodin writes that there are four kinds of interpreters of law. The most skilled among them are those who are

 ...trained not only by precepts and forensic practice but also in the finest arts and the most stable philosophy, who grasp the nature of justice, not changeable according to the wishes of men, but laid down by eternal law; who determine skillfully the standards of equity; who trace the origins of jurisprudence from ultimate principles; who pass on carefully the knowledge of all antiquity; who, of course, know the power and the dominion of the emperor, the senate, the people, and the magistrates of the Romans; who bring to the interpretation of legislation the discussion of philosophers about laws and state; who know well the Greek and Latin languages, in which the statutes are set forth; who at length circumscribe the entire division of learning within its limits, classify into types, divide into parts, point out with words, and illustrate with examples. (Bodin 1945, 4-6)

b. Theory of Climates

The Theory of Climates is among Bodin’s best-known ideas. Bodin was not the first to discuss the topic; he owes much to classical authors like Livy, Hippocrates, Aristotle and Tacitus, who are referenced by Bodin himself. He also borrows from his contemporaries—especially historians, travelers, and diplomats – like Commines, Machiavelli, Copernicus, and Jean Cardan. Bodin’s observations on climate differed from that of his medieval predecessors, since Bodin was first and foremost interested in the practical implications of a theory: a correct understanding of the laws of the environment must be thought of as the starting point for all policy, laws and institutions (Tooley 1953, 83). Bodin believed that climate and other geographical factors influence, although they do not necessarily determine, the temperament of any given people. Accordingly, the form of state and legislation needs to be adapted to the temperament of the people, and the territory that it occupies.

Three different accounts of the Theory of Climates are found in Bodin’s writings. The earliest version is in Chapter Five of the Methodus. Although this passage contains the general principles of the theory, Bodin does not relate them to contemporary politics. It is in the first chapter of the fifth book of the République that the theory of climates is further amplified, and its relationship to contemporary politics established. Moreover, the Latin translation of the République contains a few notable additions to the theory.

According to Bodin, no one who has written about states has ever considered the question of how to adapt the form of a state to the territory where it is situated (near the sea or the mountains, etc.), or to the natural aptitudes of its people. Bodin holds that, amid the uncertainty and chaos of human history, natural influences provide us with a sure criterion for historical generalization. These stable and unchanging natural influences have a dominant role in molding the personality, physique, and historical character of peoples (Brown 1969, 87-88). This naturalistic approach is, to some extent, obscured by Bodin’s belief in astrology and numerology. Racial peculiarities, the influence of the planets and Pythagorean numbers were all part of Renaissance Platonism. Bodin combined these ideas with geographic determinism that closely followed the theories of Hippocrates and Strabo. (Bodin 1945, xiii)

Ptolemy divided the world into arctic, temperate, and tropic zones. In adopting the Ptolemaic zones Bodin divided earth into areas of thirty degrees from the equator northward. Different peoples have their capabilities and weaknesses. Southern people are contemplative and religious by nature; they are wise but lack in energy. Northern people, on the other hand, are active and large in stature, but lack in sagaciousness. The people of the South are intellectually gifted and thus resemble old men while the Northern people, because of their physical qualities, remind us of youth. Those that live in between these two regions—the men of the temperate zone—lack the excesses of the previous two, while being endowed with their better qualities. They may therefore be described as men in middle life—prudent and therefore gifted to become executives and statesmen. They are the Aristotelian mean between two extremes. The superiority of this third group is stressed by Bodin throughout his writings.

3. The Six Bookes of a Commonweale

Bodin’s most prominent contribution in the field of political philosophy was first published in 1576, and in his own Latin translation a decade later. Significant differences exist between the French and Latin versions of the text. Translations into other languages soon followed: Italian (1588), Spanish (1590), German (1592), and English (1606). The République must be considered, at least partially, as Bodin’s response to the most important political crisis in France during the sixteenth century: the French wars of religion (1562-1598). It was written as a defense of the French monarchy against the so-called Monarchomach writers, among them François Hotman (1524-1590), Theodore Beza (1519-1605) and the author of the Vindiciae contra tyrannos. The Monarchomach writers called for tyrannicide and considered it the role of the magistrates and the Estates General to limit the sovereign power of the ruler, and that this power be initially derived from the people.

Bodin published three different prefaces to the République. The first is an introduction found in all French editions. The second is a prefatory letter in Latin that appears in the French editions from 1578 onwards. The third preface is an introduction to the Latin editions. These three prefaces were an opportunity for Bodin to defend his work against writers who had attacked it. They give us an account of how Bodin’s opinions developed during the years that followed the publication of the République. In 1580, Bodin answered his detractors in a work entitled Apologie de René Herpin pour la République de Jean Bodin. René Herpin was a pseudonym used by Bodin.

The first book of the République discusses the principal ends and aims of the state, its different elements, and the nature and defining marks of sovereign power. In the second book, Bodin discusses different types of states (democracy, aristocracy, and monarchy) and concludes that there cannot exist a mixed state. In Chapter Five, Bodin examines the conditions under which a tyrant, that is, an illegitimate ruler who does not possess sovereign power, may be rightfully killed. A legitimate monarch, on the other hand, may not be resisted by his subjects – even if he should act in a tyrannical manner.

Book Three discusses the different parts of the state: the senate and its role, the role of magistrates and their relationship to sovereign power, and the different degrees of authority among magistrates. Colleges, corporations and universities are also defined and considered. The origin, flourishing and decline of states, and the reasons that influence these changes are the subject of Book Four. Book Five begins with an exposition of the Theory of Climate: laws of the state and the form of government are to be adapted to the nature of each people. Bodin then discusses the climatic variations between the North and South, and how these variations affect the human temperament. The final book of the République opens with the question of cencus and censorship that is, the assessment of each individual’s belongings, and the advantages that can be derived from it. Chapters Two and Three discuss the state’s finances, and the problem of debasement of the coinage. Chapter Four is a comparison of the three forms of state; Bodin argues that royal, or hereditary, (as opposed to elective) monarchy is the best form of state. The Salic law, or law of succession to the throne, is discussed: Bodin holds that the rule of women is against divine, natural, and human law. The Salic law, together with a law forbidding alienation of the public domain, called Agrarian law in the Methodus (Bodin 1945, p. 253), is one of the two fundamental laws, or leges imperii (Fr. loix royales), which impose legal limitations upon the authority of the sovereign prince. Fundamental laws concern the state of the kingdom and are annexed to the crown, and  the sovereign prince therefore cannot detract from them.

The concluding chapter of the République is a discussion concerning the principle of justice in the government of the state. Geometric, arithmetic, and harmonic justice are explained, as well as their relation to the different forms of state. A strong Platonic influence may be detected in the final chapter of the work: a wise ruler establishes harmony within the commonwealth, just as God has established harmony in the universe he has created. Every individual has their proper place and purpose in the commonwealth.

a. Concept of Sovereignty

The République opens with the following definition of a commonwealth: “A Commonweale is a lawfull government of many families, and of that which unto them in common belongeth, with a puissant soveraigntie.” (Bodin 1962, 1) (Fr. “République est un droit gouvernement de plusieurs ménages, et de ce qui leur est commun, avec puissance souveraine.” (Bodin 1583, 1) Lat.“Respublica est familiarum rerumque inter ipsas communium summa potestate ac ratione moderata multitude.” (Bodin 1586, 1)) The meaning of sovereign power is further clarified in Chapter Eight of the first book:

Maiestie or Soveraigntie is the most high, absolute, and perpetuall power over the citisens and subiects in a Commonweale: which the Latins cal Maiestatem, the Greeks akra exousia, kurion arche, and kurion politeuma; the Italians Segnoria, and the Hebrewes tomech shévet, that is to say, The greatest power to command. (Bodin 1962, 84)

Having defined sovereignty, Bodin then defines the meaning of the terms “perpetual” and “absolute”. A person to whom sovereignty is given for a certain period of time, upon the expiration of which they once again become private citizens, cannot be called sovereign. When sovereign power is given to someone for a certain period of time, the person or persons receiving it are but the trustees and custodians of that power, and the sovereign power can be removed from them by the person or persons that are truly sovereign. Sovereignty, therefore, Bodin writes, “is not limited either in power, charge, or time certaine.” Absolute power is the power of overriding ordinary law, and it has no other condition than that which is commanded by the law of God and of nature:

But it behoveth him that is a soveraigne not to be in any sort subiect to the commaund of another … whose office it is to give laws unto his subiects, to abrogat laws unprofitable, and in their stead to establish other: which hee cannot do that is himselfe subiect unto laws, or to others which have commaund over him. And that is it for which the law saith, That the prince is acquitted from the power of the laws[.] (Bodin 1962, 91)

From this and similar passages Bodin derives the first prerogative of a sovereign prince of which he gives the following definition: “Let this be the first and chiefe marke of a soveraigne prince, to bee of power to give laws to all his subiects in generall and to everie one of them in particular ... without consent of any other greater, equall, or lesser than himselfe” (Bodin 1962, 159). All other rights and prerogatives of sovereignty are included in the power of making and repealing laws, Bodin writes, and continues, “so that (to speak properly) a man may say, that there is but this only mark of soveraigne power considering that all other the rights thereof are contained in this”. The other prerogatives include declaring war and making peace, hearing appeals in the last instance, instituting and removing the highest officers, imposing taxes on subjects or exempting them, granting pardons and dispensations, determining the name, value, and measure of the coinage, and finally, requiring subjects to swear their loyalty to their sovereign prince.

Sovereignty and its defining marks or attributes are indivisible, and supreme power within the commonwealth must necessarily be concentrated on a single person or group of persons. Bodin argues that the first prerogative of a sovereign ruler is to give law to subjects without the consent of any other individual. It is from this definition that he derives the logical impossibility of dividing sovereignty, as well as the impossibility of the existence of a mixed state: if sovereignty, in other words, the power to give law, within the state were divided, for example,  between the prince, the nobility, and the people, there would exist in the commonwealth not one, but several agents that possess the power to give law. In such a case, Bodin argues, no one can be called a subject, since all have power to make law. Additionally, no one would be able to give laws to others, since law-givers would be forced to receive law from those upon whom they wish to impose laws. The state would, therefore, be popular or democratic. In the revised Latin edition of the République the outcome of divided sovereignty is described as a state of anarchy since no one would be willing to obey laws.

b. Definition of Law

Bodin writes that there is a great difference between law (Lat. lex; Fr. loi) and right (Lat. jus; Fr. droit). Law is the command of a sovereign prince, that makes use of his power, while right implies that which is equitable. A right connotes something with a normative content; law, on the other hand, has no moral content or normative implications. Bodin writes:

We must presuppose that this word Law, without any other addition, signifieth The right command of him or them, which have soveraigne power above others, without exception of person: be it that such commaundement concerne the subiects in generall, or in particular: except him or them which have given the law. Howbeit to speake more properly, A law is the command of a Soveraigne concerning all his subiects in generall: or els concerning generall things, as saith Festus Pompeius, as a privilege concerneth some one, or some few[.] (Bodin 1962, 156)

c. Limitations upon the Authority of the Sovereign Prince

Although the sovereign prince is not bound by civil law—neither by the laws of his predecessors, which have force only as long as their maker is alive, unless ratified by the new ruler, nor by his own laws—he is not free to do as he pleases, for all earthly princes have the obligation to follow the law of God and of nature. Absolute power is power to override ordinary law, but all earthly princes are subject to divine and natural laws, Bodin writes. To contravene the laws of God, “under the greatnesse of whome all monarches of the world ought to beare the yoke, and to bow their heads in all feare and reverence”, and nature mean treason and rebellion.

Contracts with Subjects and with Foreigners

Bodin mentions a few other things - besides the laws of God and of nature - that limit the sovereign prince’s authority. These include the prince’s contracts with his subjects and foreign princes, property rights of the citizens, and constitutional laws (leges imperii) of the realm. Regarding the difference between contracts and laws, Bodin writes that the sovereign prince is subject to the just and reasonable contracts that he has made, and in the observation of which his subjects have an interest, whilst laws obligate all subjects but not the prince. A contract between a sovereign prince and his subjects is mutually binding and it obligates both parties reciprocally. The prince, therefore, has no advantage over the subject on this matter. The prince must honor is contracts for three reasons: 1) Natural equity, which requires that agreements and promises be kept; 2) The prince’s honor and his good faith, since there is “no more detestable crime in a prince, than to bee false of his oath and promise”; and 3) The prince is the guarantor of the conventions and obligations that his subjects have with each other – it is therefore all the more important that the sovereign prince should render justice for his own act.

Fundamental Laws

Two fundamental laws (leges imperii) are discussed in the République. The first one is the Salic law, or the law of succession to the throne. The Salic law guarantees the continuity of the crown, and determines the legitimate successor (see Franklin 1973, Chapter 5). The other fundamental law is the law against alienation of the royal domain, which Bodin calls “Agrarian law” in the Methodus. As Franklin has observed, “The domain was supposed to have been set aside in order to provide a king with a source of annual income normally sufficient to defray the costs of government” (1973, 73). If the domain is alienated, this signifies lesser income to the crown, and possibly increased taxation upon the citizens. Fundamental laws are annexed and united to the crown, and therefore the sovereign ruler cannot infringe them. But should the prince decide to do so, his successor can always annul that which has been done in prejudice of the fundamental laws of the realm.

Inviolability of Private Property

Finally, Bodin derives from both natural law and the Old Testament that the sovereign prince may not take the private property of his subjects without their consent since this would mean violating the law of God and of nature. He writes: “Now then if a soveraigne prince may not remove the bounds which almightie God (of whom he is the living & breathing image) hath prefined unto the everlasting lawes of nature: neither may he take from another man that which is his, without iust cause” (Bodin 1962, 109; 110). The only exception to the rule, the just causes that Bodin refers to in this passage, concern situations where the very existence of the commonwealth is threatened. In such cases, public interest must be preferred over the private, and citizens must give up their private property in order to guarantee the safety and continuing existence of the commonwealth.

The preceding passage is one among many where the sovereign prince is described by Bodin as the “earthly image of God,” “God’s lieutenant for commanding other men,” or the person “to whom God has given power over us”. It is from this principle regarding the inviolability of private property that Bodin derives that new taxes may not be imposed upon citizens without their consent.

d. Difference between Form of State and Form of Government

Bodin holds that sovereignty cannot be divided – it must necessarily reside in one person or group of persons. Having shown that sovereignty is indivisible, Bodin moves on to refute the widely accepted political myth of the Renaissance that the Polybian model of a mixed state was the optimal form of state. Contrary to the opinions of Polybius, Aristotle, and Cicero, Bodin writes that there are only three types of state or commonwealth: monarchy, where sovereignty is vested with one person, aristocracy, where sovereignty is vested with a minority, and democracy, where sovereignty is vested in all of the people or a majority among them. Bodin’s denial of the possibility of dividing sovereignty directly results in the impossibility of a mixed state in the form that most Renaissance political theorists conceived it. It is with the help of historical and modern examples, most notably of Rome and Venice, that Bodin shows that the states that were generally believed to possess a mixed regime were not really so.

Even though Bodin refuses the idea that there be more than three types of commonwealth, he is willing to accept that there is a variety of governments - that is, different ways to govern the state. The way that the state is governed in no way alters its form nor its structure. Discussion concerning the difference between the form of state and government is found in Book Two. Bodin remarks that despite the importance of the question, no one before him has ever addressed it. All monarchies, aristocracies and popular states are either tyrannical, despotic, or legitimate (i.e. royal). These are not different species of commonwealth, Bodin observes, but diverse ways of governing the state. Tyrannical monarchy is one in which the sovereign ruler violates the laws of God, oppresses his subjects and treats their private property as his own. Tyrannical monarchy must not be confused with despotic monarchy, Bodin writes. Despotic, or lordly, monarchy “is that where the prince is become lord of the goods and persons of his subiects, by law of arms and lawfull warre; governing them as the master of a familie doth his slaves.” Bodin holds that there is nothing unfitting in a prince who has defeated his enemies in a just war, and who governs them under the laws of war and the law of nations. Finally, royal or legitimate monarchy is one in which the subjects obey the laws of the sovereign prince, and the prince in his turn obeys the laws of God and of nature; natural liberty and the right to private property are secured to all citizens.

Although most of Bodin’s examples concern monarchy, he writes that “The same difference is also found in the Aristocratique and popular estate: for both the one and the other may be lawful, lordly, and tirannicall, in such sort as I have said” (Bodin 1962, 200). Bodin qualifies as “absurd” and “treasonable” opinions according to which the constitution of France is a mixture of the three types of state—the Parlement representing aristocracy, the Estates General democracy, and the King representing monarchy.

e. The Question of Slavery

The question of slavery is addressed in Book One, Chapter Five of the République. Bodin is recognized today as one of the earliest advocates of the abolition of slavery. For him, slavery was a universal phenomenon in the sense that slaves exist in all parts of the world, and slavery was widely accepted by the droit des gens. Bodin writes that there are difficulties concerning slavery that have never been resolved. He wishes to answer the following question: “Is slavery natural and useful, or contrary to nature?”

Bodin opposes Aristotle’s opinion (Politics 1254a) according to which slavery is something natural – some people are born to govern and command, while it is the role of others to serve and obey. Bodin admits that “there is certain plausibility in the argument that slavery is natural and useful in the commonwealth.” After all, Bodin continues, the institution of slavery has existed in all commonwealths, and in all ages wise and good men have owned slaves. But if we are to consider the question according to commonly received opinions, thus allowing ourselves to be less concerned with philosophical arguments, we will soon understand that slavery is unnatural and contrary to human dignity.

Bodin’s opposition to slavery is manifold. First of all, he considers slavery in most cases to be unnatural, as the following passage attests: “I confesse that servitude is well agreeing unto nature, when a strong man, rich and ignorant, yeeldeth his obedience and service unto a wise, discreet and feeble poore man: but for wise men to serve fools, men of understanding to serve the ignorant, and the good to serve the bad; what can bee more contrarie unto nature?” (Bodin 1962, 34) Secondly, slavery is an affront to religion since the law of God forbids making any man a slave against their good will and consent. Thirdly, slavery is against human dignity, because of the countless indescribable humiliations that slaves have been forced to suffer. According to one interpretation, Bodin’s opposition to slavery must above all be understood within the context of his opinions concerning the commonwealth in that slavery poses a permanent threat to the stability of the state. Bodin relies on a historical narrative to prove that slavery is incompatible with a stable commonwealth (Herrel 1994, 56). Thus, in the following passage, he states:

Wherefore seeing it is proved by the examples of so many worlds of years, so many inconveniences of rebellions, servile warres, conspiracies eversions and changes to have happened unto Commonweals by slaves; so many murthers, cruelties, and detestable villanies to have bene committed upon the persons of slaves by their lords and masters: who can doubt to affirme it to be a thing most pernitious and daungerous to have brought them into a Commonweale; or having cast them off, to receive them againe? (Bodin 1962, 44)

4. Bodin’s Economic Thought

Bodin’s main economic ideas are expressed in two works: initially, in his Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit, first published in 1568, then in a revised second version, in 1578. The Response is an analysis of the reasons for the significant and continuous price rises that afflicted sixteenth century Europe. It is in this work that Bodin is said to have given one of the earliest formulations of the Quantity Theory of Money. In its most elementary form, the Quantity Theory of Money is the affirmation that money supply directly affects price levels. Chapter Two of the sixth book of the République is a lengthy discussion of the possible resources of the state. There is a partial overlap between the two works since Bodin included certain passages of the Response in his République, and then incorporated them again in a revised form into the second edition of the Response.

a. Quantitative Theory of Money

High inflation was rampant in sixteenth century Europe. It began in Spain, and soon spread to its neighboring states. This was mainly due to the increase in the quantity of precious metals, namely silver and gold, that were brought by boat to Europe from the Spanish colonies in the New World. In 1563, the Chambre des Comptes de Paris decided to investigate the reasons for inflation, and the results of the investigation were published in 1566 in a study entitled The Paradoxes of the Seigneur de Malestroit on the Matter of Money. The author of the study was a man called Jean Cherruies “Seigneur de Malestroit”, of whom we know only fairly little. It was these “paradoxes” that Jean Bodin sought to refute in his work.

Malestroit held that the price rises are simply changes in the unit of account that have been occasioned by debasement, and that prices of precious metals have remained constant for three hundred years.

Bodin refuted Malestroit’s analysis on two counts. First, he was able to show that Malestroit’s use of data was incorrect: Malestroit’s central claim to back up his thesis was the unchanging price of velvet since the fourteenth century. Bodin, however, cast doubt on the fact whether velvet was even known in France at such an early period. Secondly, Bodin was able to demonstrate that debasement alone did not explain the reasons for such major and significant price rises; while debasement was one of the factors that had occasioned such inflation, it was far from being the principal cause.

Bodin lists five major factors as contributory causes for such widespread inflation:  (1) The sudden abundance of precious metals, namely silver and gold, throughout Europe; (2) Monopolies; (3) Scarcity, caused by excessive export trade, quasi non-existing import trade, and waste; (4) Fashionable demand by rich people for certain luxury products; and, finally, (5) Debasement.

Of these five causes, Bodin considered the abundance of precious metals to be the most important.

b. The State’s Finances and the Question of Taxation and Property Rights

In Chapter Two of the final book of the République Bodin discusses the question of the commonwealth securing its finances. Seven possible sources of income are listed. These are: (1) Public domain; (2) Profits of conquests; (3) Gifts from friends; (4) Tributes from allies; (5) Profits of trading ventures; (6) Customs on exports and imports; and, finally, (7) Taxes on the subject. Bodin considers the public domain to be the most honest and the most reliable source of income for the commonwealth. He writes that throughout history sovereign princes and their citizens have taken it as a universal rule that the public domain should be holy, inviolable and inalienable. The inalienability of the public domain is of the utmost importance, Bodin writes, in order that “princes should not bee forced to overcharge their subiects with imposts, or to seeke any unlawfull meanes to forfeit their goods”. The seventh method of raising revenue on Bodin’s list is by levying taxes on the subject, but it may be used only when all other measures have failed and the preservation of the commonwealth demands it.

Bodin considers the inalienability of the public domain, together with the Salic law, to be one of the fundamental laws (Lat. leges imperii; Fr. loix royales) of the state. Like many of his contemporaries, Bodin held that the levying of new taxes without consent was a violation of the property rights of the individual, and, as such, contrary to the law of God and nature. He was particularly firm in opposing new taxation without proper consent and sought confirmation for his opinion in French and European history. One of the main differences between a legitimate ruler and an illegitimate one concerns the question of how each treats the private property of their subjects. Property rights are protected by the law of God and of nature, and therefore, violation of the private property of citizens is a violation of the law of God and of nature. A tyrant makes his subjects into his slaves, and treats their private property as if it were his own.

5. Writings Concerning Religion

The 16th and 17th centuries witnessed fierce internal conflict and power struggles at the heart of Christianity. The country most seriously ravaged by the combat between the Catholics and the Huguenots was France. Furthermore, a world of hugely diverse religious beliefs had been recently unveiled beyond the walls of Christendom, and the question of knowing which religion was the true religion (vera religio), or that which God wanted humanity to follow, needed to be addressed. Bodin’s main contributions concerning religion are Démonomanie, Colloquium heptaplomeres and the Universae naturae theatrum. Additionally, the République contains passages that discuss religion and the stability of the state.

a. Colloquium heptaplomeres and the Question of Religious Tolerance

Bodin’s Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime (Colloquium heptaplomeres de rerum sublimium arcanis abditis) is often described as one of the earliest works of comparative religion. It is believed to have been written sometime during the 1580s, although it was circulated in manuscript for nearly three centuries before it was published in its entirety in 1857. The Colloquium is a discussion between seven men of different religions or convictions that have gathered in the home of Coronaeus, a Catholic living in Venice, Italy. The participants are Salomon, a Jew, Octavius, a convert from Catholicism to Islam, Toralba, a natural philosopher, Senamus a skeptic, Fridericus, a Lutheran, and Curtius a Calvinist. The men engage in listening to music, reading, gastronomical delights, and discussions concerning religion.

The Colloquium begins with a story that is told by Octavius. A ship leaves the port of Alexandria as gentle winds blow, but an intensive tempest soon arises. The ship’s captain, terrified by the situation, is forced to drop the anchors, and urges everyone to pray to God. The crewmen, being from many different places and of various confessions, all pray for the one God that they have faith in. The storm calms down eventually and the ship is brought safely to port. When Octavius had finished his story, Coronaeus asked the following question: “Finally, with such a variety of religions represented [on the ship], whose prayers did God heed in bringing the ship safely to port?”

The matter of true religion is discussed in the final three books of the Colloquium heptaplomeres. True religion, Bodin holds, is tolerant of all religions, and accepts different ways to approach God. Leathers Kuntz has observed that “no religion is true whose point of view is not universal, whose expression is not free, whose center does not reflect the intimate harmony of God and nature” (Bodin 2008, xliii). The same opinion is expressed in the Démonomanie and in Bodin’s letter to one Jean Bautru des Matras, an advocate working in Paris. In the latter, Bodin writes that “different opinions concerning religion must not lead you astray, as long as you understand that true religion is nothing else than the turning of a purged soul toward true God”.

b. The Question of True Religion and Bodin’s Personal Faith

Leathers Kuntz has detected three stages in the development of Bodin’s religious thinking. She has argued that Bodin’s religious views became more liberal as he grew older (Bodin 2008, xliii-xliv). In 1559, when he wrote the Discours au Senate et au peuple de Toulouse, Bodin held that people should be brought up publicly in one religion. This he considered as an indispensable element in the cohesiveness of the state. Religious unity should be preserved, and religion should not be debated, since disputations damage religion and cast doubt upon it. When writing the République, Bodin’s main concern was the political stability of the French state. He considered religion to provide for the unity of the state, and as supporting the king’s power. Furthermore, religion strengthened the subjects’ obedience toward their sovereign prince and their respect for the execution of laws. Uniformity of worship must be enforced within the commonwealth when it is possible, but tolerance should become the norm when religious minorities become influential enough to no longer be repressed. The final and most liberal stage of Bodin’s religious opinions becomes most apparent in the Colloquium heptaplomeres, “in which his religious opinions seem to have developed into a kind of theism which leaves each man’s religion, provided he has some, to his own personal conscience” (ibid.).

It is impossible to say anything definitive concerning Bodin’s religious views. We may observe that Bodin’s faith seems less loyal to a particular established church than to a deep sense of honoring God. Bodin’s public religious opinions fluctuated throughout his life. As a consequence, he was accused of many things, including of being a Jew, a Calvinist, a heretical Catholic, and an atheist during his lifetime and after his death. Some scholars have even suggested that there are traces of Nicodemism, or religious dissimulation, in both his works and actions.

Scholars have debated for many years the question of knowing which of the opinions expressed in the Colloquium heptaplomeres should be regarded as Bodin’s personal beliefs. Considering that so many, often contradictory, opinions have been advanced, it may be wise to remark that perhaps “all the speakers represent Bodin’s thinking at one time or another. No one represents his thinking exclusively, but Bodin is sympathetic to some views of each as the dialogue develops. The point seems to be, however, that regardless of Bodin’s approval or disapproval of the religious views represented in the dialogue, he constantly stresses the need for toleration of all religions” (Bodin 2008, xliv). It has also been suggested that Bodin’s opinions and views regarding religious faith are so full of compromise that they ultimately amount to a sort of natural religion. Finally, it has been suggested that Bodin’s writings on the topic of religion “transcended the narrow bounds of confessional religion” (Bodin 1980, 1).

Although Bodin’s understanding of true religion as something profoundly personal, for which no church was required, made him an unorthodox believer in the eyes of many, it seems inconceivable that he should be considered an atheist (Bodin 2008, xxix). In fact, he considered atheism to be extremely dangerous to the commonwealth, as the following passage from the République (4, VII), discussing the difference between atheism and superstition, proves:

 And truely they (in mine opinion) offend much, which thinke that the same punishment is to be appointed for them that make many gods, and them that would have none at all: or that the infinitie of gods admitted, the almightie and everliving God is thereby taken away. For that superstition how great soever it be, doth yet hold men in feare and awe, both of the laws and of the magistrats; as also in mutuall duties and offices one of them towards another: whereas mere Atheisme doth utterly root out of mens minds all the feare of doing evill. (Bodin 1962, 539)

Bodin’s reasons for combating atheism in this passage concern the stability of the state: atheists must not be tolerated in the commonwealth since they hold neither moral nor ethical issues regarding breaking the laws of the state. But Bodin had another reason to detest atheism: atheists are blasphemous because they deny the existence of God.

6. On Witchcraft

Bodin’s De la démonomanie des sorciers (On the Demon-Mania of Witches) was first published in 1580 in French, and soon translated into Latin (1581), German (1581) and Italian (1587). Because of its wide distribution and numerous editions, historians have held it accountable for prosecutions of witches during the years that followed its publication. Many readers have been perplexed by the intolerant character of the Démonomanie. Bodin had a strong belief in the existence of angels and demons, and believed that they served as intermediaries between God and human beings; God intervenes directly in the world through the activity of angels and demons. Demonism, together with atheism and any attempt to manipulate demonic forces through witchcraft or natural magic, was treason against God and to be punished with extreme severity. The principal reason, therefore, to punish someone of witchcraft is “to appease the anger of God, especially if the crime is directly against the majesty of God, as this one is”.

Bodin was given the incentive to write the Démonomanie after he took part in the proceedings against a witch in April 1578. His objective in writing the Démonomanie was to “throw some light on the subject of witches, which seems marvelously strange to everyone and unbelievable to many.” Furthermore, the work was to serve as “a warning to all those who read it, in order to make it clearly known that there are no crimes which are nearly so vile as this one, or which deserve more serious penalties.” Finally, he wished to “respond to those who in printed books try to save witches by every means, so that it seems Satan has inspired them and drawn them to his line in order to publish these fine books” (Bodin 2001, 35-7). Among these “protectors of witches,” as Bodin qualified them, was a German Protestant by the name of Johann Weyer, who considered witches to be delusional and excessively melancholic, and recommended physical healing and religious instruction as a remedy to their condition, rather than corporal or capital punishment. Bodin feared that this might lead judges to consider witches as mentally ill, and, as a consequence, permit them to go without punishment.

The Démonomanie is divided into four books. Book One begins with a set of definitions. Bodin then discusses to what extent men may engage in the occult, and the differences between lawful and unlawful means to accomplish things. He also discusses the powers of witches and their practices: whether witches are able to transform men into beasts, induce or inspire in them illnesses, or perhaps even bring about their death. The final book is a discussion concerning ways to investigate and prosecute witches. Bodin’s severity and his rigorousness in condemning witches and witchcraft is largely based on the contents of the final book of the Démonomanie.

Bodin lists three necessary and indisputable proofs upon which a sentence can be based: (1) Truth of the acknowledged and concrete fact; (2) Testimony of several sound witnesses; and (3) Voluntary confession of the person who is charged and convicted of the crime. Certain other types of evidence, such as public reputation or forced confession, are not regarded by Bodin as indisputable proofs, but simply as “presumptions”, or circumstantial evidence, concerning the guilty nature of the person being charged. Presumptions may serve in the conviction and sentencing of witches in cases where clear proof is lacking.

There are fifteen “detestable crimes” that witches may be guilty of, and even the least of them, Bodin affirms, merits painful death. The death penalty, however, must only be sentenced by a competent judge and based on solid proof that eliminates all possibility of error. In cases where sufficient proof is wanting, where there are neither witnesses, nor confession, nor factual evidence, and where only mere presumptions, even strong ones, exist, Bodin is opposed to a death sentence: “I do not recommend that because of strong presumptions one pass sentence of death – but any other penalty except death...One must be very sure of the truth to impose the death sentence.” Bodin may have considered witchcraft an insult against God, and as such meriting the penalty of death, but he nevertheless believed in the rule of law, as in this other passage where he unequivocally states that “it is better to acquit the guilty than to condemn the innocent” (Bodin 2001, 209-210).

7. Natural Philosophy

The Universae naturae theatrum, which was published in the year of his death in 1596, may be considered as the most systematic exposition of Bodin’s vision of the world. It remains the least studied of his works and has never been translated into English. Bodin himself informs us that the Theatrum was written in 1590. The French translation of the work (Le Théâtre de la nature universelle) was published in 1597.

Ever since the beginning of his career Bodin sought to methodologically study all things, human and divine. He writes:

Of history, that is, the true narration of things, there are three kinds: human, natural, and divine. The first concerns man; the second, nature; the third, the Father of nature. /…/ So it shall come about that from thinking first about ourselves, then about our family, then about our society we are led to examine nature and finally to the true history of Immortal God, that is, to contemplation. (Bodin 1945, 15-16)

The Theatrum is the culmination point of Bodin’s systematic examination of things, and as such it is a deeply religious work. Bodin turns to the study of nature in order to better know God:

And indeed the Theater of Nature is nothing other than the contemplation of those things founded by the immortal God as if a certain tablet were placed under the eyes of every single one so that we may embrace and love the majesty of that very author, his goodness, wisdom, and remarkable care in the greatest matters, in moderate affairs, in matters of the least importance” (Bodin 2008, xxx)

Bodin believed that the French civil wars were occasioned, at least partly, by God’s dissatisfaction – God was punishing the French for their growing irreligious sentiment. The Theatrum has been described as an attack against those arrogant and ungodly philosophers, or naturalists, who wish to explain everything without reference to the creator and father of all things that is God. God is the author of all existing things, and the contemplation of nature brings us closer to Him. Furthermore, contemplating nature makes us love God for the care and goodness that he shows us.

The Theatrum has been written in a pseudo-dialogue form; it is a discussion between an informant, Mystagogus, and his questioner Theorus. The work opens with a short overview of the text, in which Bodin stresses the importance of order for the study of things. This gives him the opportunity to criticize Aristotle, who failed to discuss things in the right order; simpler things must be discussed before more complex ones, and therefore matters of physics should have been discussed after metaphysical things. Arranging all the material that is being considered in a convenient order – simplest notions to be studied first, and difficult ones later – is one of the distinctive characteristics of the Ramist framework of knowledge, as McRae has observed (McRae 1955, 8). McRae considers that, together with the Juris universi distributio, Bodin’s Theatrum “is perhaps the most thoroughly Ramist of any of his works.” Bodin’s two main objectives in the first book of the Theatrum are to prove that there is only one principle in nature, that is, God, and, that it is He who has created this world and He who governs it.

Other topics that Bodin discusses in Book One include matter, form and the causes of things. Furthermore, movement, generation, corruption and growth are considered, as well as things related to them: time and place, void, finitude and infinitude. In Book Two, Bodin examines elements, meteorites, rocks, metals and minerals. Book Three is a discussion on the subjects of the nature of plants and animals. The fourth book contains Bodin’s doctrine concerning soul; angels are also discussed in Book Four. The final book of the Theatrum discusses celestial bodies – their natural movement, the admirable harmony that exists between them, and the structure of the heavens. The final book attests of Bodin’s enmity toward Copernicus’ heliocentric system (Bodin 1596, 554 and especially 574-583); Bodin relies on the writings of Ptolemy, Aristotle, and the Holy Scripture in combating Copernicus. He dismisses Copernicus’ hypothesis concerning the heliocentric system on the grounds that it is “contrary to the evidence of the senses, to the authority of the Scriptures, and incompatible with Aristotelian physics.”

According to a recent interpretation by Blair, Bodin’s objective in writing the Theatrum was first and foremost to combat three impious propositions of ancient philosophy: (1) The eternity of the world; (2) The necessity of the laws of nature; and (3) The mortality of the soul.

Against the Eternity of the World

One solution to the conflict between Aristotelian philosophy of the eternity of the world and the Judeo-Christian account of creation—God has created the world, therefore it is not eternal, had been proposed by Thomas Aquinas. He argued that human reason alone cannot establish whether the world is eternal or not; the problem can be solved only by an appeal to faith and to biblical authority. Bodin’s argument differs from that of Aquinas. Bodin offers a rational demonstration based on “arguments for an all-powerful God, who knows no necessity and has complete free will”. Several scholars have observed that Bodin’s emphasis on divine free will is “characteristic of Christian nominalists like Duns Scotus and of Jewish philosophers like Maimonides” (Blair 1997, 118) The concluding syllogism for the “voluntary first cause” that is God is as follows: “Nothing can be eternal by nature whose first cause is voluntary; but the first cause of the world is voluntary; therefore the world cannot be eternal by nature, since its state and condition depend on the decision and free will of another.” (Blair 1997, 118)

Against Natural Necessity

The second conclusion is drawn from the unlimited freedom of God’s will: not only is it impossible that the world should be eternal, but furthermore it is arranged according to a divine plan. According to Bodin, providential divine governance is twofold: ordinary providence, where laws that govern nature under so-called normal circumstances are chosen by God, and extraordinary providence, where God is able to suspend those laws at will at any time he chooses, in order to intervene in the world (Blair 1997, 120). Bodin offers the following explanation for the existence of apparently useless or evil features of nature. He begins by claiming that everything in creation is good, and evil is simply the absence of good; this same idea is repeated in the Paradoxon. Then he attempts to illustrate, through various examples, that even things that are apparently evil in nature serve a “useful purpose in God’s good and wise plan” (Blair 1997, 122).

Immortality of the Soul

Bodin’s demonstration concerning the immortality of the soul is based on the soul’s intermediate nature: the soul is both corporeal and immortal. Blair defines this particular demonstration as “possibly Bodin’s most noteworthy innovation” and as a “significant departure from the standard or orthodox accounts [concerning the soul]” (Blair 1997, 137; 142). In combating the mortality of the soul, Blair writes, Bodin is reacting against all forms of impious philosophizing: against Averroes for denying the personal immortality of the soul; against Pomponazzi for claiming that philosophy shows the soul to be mortal; and against all those, like Pomponazzi or even Duns Scotus, who deny the rational demonstrability of this central doctrine. But Bodin calls his opponents only “Epicureans,” using the term to designate at first, generally, those who doubt the immortality of the soul, then more specifically those who, barely above the level of brutes, take pleasure and pain as the measure of good and evil and believe in the random distribution of atoms. (Blair 1997, 138)

Bodin’s first argument in favor of the immortality of the soul is based on empirical evidence concerning the ability of the soul to function independently of the body: during ecstatic experiences, as these have been conveyed by many learned men, it has been reported that the soul is able to hear, feel and understand while being temporarily transported outside the living body. Two further demonstrations follow. First, Bodin affirms that extremes are always joined by intermediates; passing from one extreme to another always necessitates passing through a 'middle' being and that there exists only two extremes in the world; (1) Form completely separated from matter, meaning angels and demons, and (2) Form entirely concrete, inseparable from matter, except by destruction, that is, natural bodies. Between these two extremes there must necessarily exist some intermediate which joins the two. This intermediate is form separable from matter, or, as Bodin states it, the soul. He concludes: “if therefore the human soul [mens] is separable from the dead body, it follows necessarily that it survives and carries out its actions without the operation of the senses” (Blair 1997, 139). Bodin’s final demonstration is as follows:

Given the extremes, of which one is totally corruptible (natural elements or bodies) and one is totally incorruptible (angels and demons), there must be an intermediate, which is corrupted in one part of itself, but free from corruption in the other; but this is nothing other than man, who participates in both natures: brute elements, plants, stones are far inferior to man in worth and dignity, and since man alone associates with angels and demons, he alone can link the celestial to the terrestrial, superior to inferior, immortal to mortal. (Blair 1997, 139)

Humans participate in both extremes and yet form an entity that is distinct from them. According to the standard view, the corporeal body is connected with the incorporeal soul, but Bodin’s demonstration is not built on this distinction because, for him, the soul is both immortal and corporeal. As Blair has observed, “for Bodin the human hypostasis mediates between form separated from matter (disembodied souls and angels) and form fully embedded in matter (as in all natural bodies), by virtue of its soul, which is corporeal, yet separable from the material body” (Blair 1997, 139-40). The following passage elucidates Bodin’s rather peculiar demonstration:

The body of the soul is not material, but spiritual – yet corporeal nonetheless: “from which it follows that human souls, angels and demons consist of the same corporeal nature, but not of bone, nor of flesh, but of an invisible essence. Like air, or fire, or both, or of a celestial essence, surpassing with its fineness the most subtle bodies: thus, even if we grant it is a spiritual body, it is a body nonetheless.” (Blair 1997, 140)

According to Blair, Bodin constructs a new type of natural philosophy that seeks to combine religion with philosophy, a combination of philosophical research concerning causes with a pious recognition of divine providence and the greatness of God.

Although Bodin often refers to Holy Scripture, he also constantly reminds us of the importance of reason and reasoning – so long as we do not infringe upon the limits of reason. Bodin uses physics to serve religious ends and the fundamental principle behind Bodin’s strategy is the Augustinian precept, later adopted by Aquinas in his synthesis of reason and faith, that truth is one and that there is, indeed, unity of knowledge: a necessary agreement between philosophy and religion exists, and therefore “natural philosophy as a reasoned investigation can never contradict true religion” (Blair 1997, 143).

8. Other Works

a. Juris universi distributio

The Juris universi distributio (Fr. Exposé du droit universel) was first published in 1578, but, as the Dedicatory Epistle of the Methodus informs us, it already existed in manuscript form twelve years earlier. Unlike later editions of the work that were published as books, the first edition of the Distributio was in the form of a poster, measuring approximately 40 by 180 cm, to be hung on the walls of universities.

Bodin’s objective in writing the Juris universi distributio was to arrive at a systematization of universal law. He sought to realize this by the study of history, paired with a comparative method which analyzes the different legal systems that either currently exist or have existed in the past. Bodin uses the same method in his main political works, (République and Methodus), in which comparative public law and its historical study permit Bodin to erect a theory of the state. Bodin is interested in “universal history”, of which his Methodus is an example, in the same way that he is interested in “universal law”, and it seems that the same type of historical and comparative method may be used in discovering them.

According to Bodin, law is divided into two categories: natural (ius naturale) and human (ius humanum). Bodin thus rejects the common threefold division based on the Digest – natural law, law of peoples and civil law –  because he considers dichotomy more convenient. The two principal divisions of human law are ius civile (civil law) and ius gentium (law of peoples). Bodin strongly criticizes law professors, or Romanists, for he writes that they have concentrated almost exclusively on ius civile – particularly the civil law of the Romans - and that, as a consequence, the ius gentium has not been properly studied, and, therefore, has no proper methodology. Bodin’s personal interest lies precisely in the ius gentium because it is concerned with the universal laws that are common to all peoples. The methods of the Romanists are inadequate for the study of ius gentium because the ius civile varies from state to state and no universally valid truths can be derived from it; in this sense it is not even part of legal science. A new critical method is therefore required; a method that is both historical and comparative.

Bodin’s system of universal law is a drastic rupture with the exegetical methods of the Middle Ages. Medieval jurists applied Roman law to their own societies and saw no problem in doing so. It is with the arrival of the so-called humanist scholars, in the sixteenth century, and their use of the methods of classical philology, that the internal coherence and authority of the Corpus juris civilis were challenged.

b. Moral Philosophy

Bodin’s Paradoxon quod nec virtus ulla in mediocritate nec summum hominis bonum in virtutis actione consistere possit (Fr. Paradoxe de Jean Bodin qu’il n’y a pas de vertu en médiocrité ni au milieu de deux vices) was first published in Latin in 1596, although Bodin had completed the text in 1591. Two French translations were later published. Bodin’s own translation dates from 1596, but it remained unpublished until 1598. Bodin’s translation may be considered as a revised version of the Latin text, rather than its simple translation. The Latin edition includes a preface that does not exist in the French version.

The Paradoxon has been written in dialogue form, and is a discussion between a father and a son. During the course of the dialogue, the son repeatedly refers to the authority of Aristotle. His opinions are often refuted by the father, who refers to the writings of Plato and to the Holy Scripture. The term “paradox” in the title refers to the fact that Bodin acknowledges his views to be in contradiction with the moral opinions that were generally accepted in his day – especially concerning the Aristotelian doctrine of the mean.

The work opens with a discussion concerning the question of good and evil and that of divine justice. This is followed by an outline of the basic structure of Bodin’s moral philosophy: God is the sovereign good, or, “that which is the most useful and the most necessary to every imaginable creature”. He is also the source of all other things that are good. Evil is defined as the privation of good – a definition that Bodin traces to St. Augustine. The same definition is found in the Theatrum, where it is used to support the argument that everything in Creation is good – God has not created anything evil (Blair 1997, 122). The good of man and a contented life are discussed, followed by a discussion concerning particular virtues and vices, as well as their origins. Bodin refutes Aristotle’s doctrine of the mean. Discussion concerning moral and intellectual virtues follows. Bodin then examines prudence; he then claims that prudence alone helps us choose between good and evil. The final section discusses wisdom and the love of God. The father affirms that wisdom is found in the fear of offending God. Fear of God is inseparable from love of God – together they form the basis of wisdom.

c. Writings on Education

Bodin wrote or compiled four works where he discusses the education of children: The Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on the Education of Youth in the Commonwealth, Epître à son neveu, Sapientia moralis epitome, and Consilium de institutione principis aut alius nobilioris ingenii. The earliest of them, the Oratio, is a discourse that was given in Toulouse in 1559, and published the same year. The three other works date from a later period; the Epître is a letter written to Bodin’s nephew, dated November 1586, and the Epitome was first published in 1588. Evidence within the Consilia suggests that it was written sometime between 1574 and 1586, although it remained unpublished until 1602.

Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on the Education of Youth in the Commonwealth

Bodin’s Oratio de instituenda in repub. juventute ad senatum populumque tolosatem (Fr. Le discours au sénat et au peuple de Toulouse sur l’éducation à donner aux jeunes gens dans la république) is the most valuable single document that informs us of Bodin’s stay in Toulouse in the 1550's. Furthermore, it is Bodin’s earliest surviving work on education and contains a detailed portrayal of the humanist ideal that Bodin embraced during this period.

Nothing is more salutary to a city than to have those who shall one day rule the nation be educated according to virtue and science. It is only by providing youth with proper education and intellectual and moral culture that the glory of France, and that of its cities could be preserved. Art and science are the auxiliaries of virtue, and one cannot conceive of living – much less leading a happy life – without them. Bodin urges the people of Toulouse to participate in the movement of the Renaissance. The town is well-known for its faculty of law, and he argues that the study of humanities and belles-lettres should also be appended to the study of law.

In Bodin's time, the children of Toulouse were either given a public education – in which case they were most often sent to Paris – or taught privately, in domicile. While both systems have their inconveniences, Bodin considers that public schooling must be favored. In order to prevent children from being sent to Paris to be educated, however, a collège must be built in Toulouse and the children of Toulouse should be educated in their own hometown. Bodin proposes that all children – including gifted children belonging to the poorest classes – be sent to public schools where they shall be taught according to the official method.

Epître de Jean Bodin touchant l’institution de ses enfants à son neveu

This short work is Bodin’s response in the form of a letter dated November 9, 1586, to his nephew’s enquiry concerning the education of children. Bodin’s nephew had welcomed a newborn son to his family, and had turned to Bodin for advice on how to give him a proper education. Bodin’s advice came in the form of a description of how he taught his own children when they were three and four years old.

Bodin began by teaching his children the Latin names of things. Having observed that they have a good memory and necessary mental capacities, Bodin asked them to repeat more abstract words, and began informing them about such things as how old the world is (5,534 years), how many planets there are, and the names of these planets. He taught them the names of body parts, what senses we have, the virtues and vices, and so forth. Knowledge of different things was acquired by a continuous daily exercise. Soon after, Bodin had his children interrogate each other, thus allowing himself to retire from this task. The study of Latin grammar soon followed, as well as the study of moral sentences in both French and Latin. The children would then begin the study of arithmetic and geometry. This was followed by the translation of Cicero’s writings from Latin to French.

Sapientia moralis epitome 

The Sapientia moralis epitome was published in Paris in 1588. It consists of 210 moral maxims that have been arranged into groups of seven sentences. Each group is a discussion upon a common topic: youth and education, nature, truth and opinion, virtue, war, liberty, marriage, etc. The majority of the maxims are Bodin’s own formulations of ideas expressed by Ovid, Horace, Juvenale and Lucretius.

Consilium de institutione principis

Bodin’s Consilium de institutione principis was first published in 1602 as part of a compilation entitled Consilia Iohannis Bodini Galli et Fausti Longiani Itali de principe recte instituendo. Although the determination of a precise date seems impossible, evidence within the work suggests that Bodin composed it sometime between 1574 and 1586.

The Consilium is a collection of precepts for the young princes of the Saxon court. The content of the Consilium is in many ways identical to the views that were expressed in the Epître, although the Consilium is more detailed. Young princes are to be taught in small groups, and their eating and sleeping habits are to be observed, so that they remain alert and in good health.

Bodin particularly recommends the study of two texts: Peter Ramus’ Dialectica, and Pibrac du Faur’s Quatrains. The education of the princes is to be completed by the study of law and the art of government. Knowledge of practical matters should be acquired by studying “the state of the republica and its offices and the laws, customs and natures of various peoples.” Knowledge in practical matters is necessary in order to acquire prudence. According to Bodin, only a prudent prince is worthy of his people (Rose 1980, 57-58).

d. Bodin’s Surviving Correspondence

Several letters from Bodin’s personal correspondence have survived to the present day; (for the complete list, see Couzinet 2001, 32-36). Chauviré published a series of letters as an Appendix to his Jean Bodin, auteur de la République. The most important among them are Bodin’s letter, written in Latin, to one Jean Bautru des Matras, as well as Bodin’s account from January 1583, addressed to his brother-in-law, regarding the events that took place in Antwerp when the Duke of Alençon was trying to help the Low Countries in their efforts to drive out the Spanish.

Later, Moreau-Reibel made a discovery in France’s Bibliothèque Nationale, recueil manuscrit 4897 of the library’s fonds français, and published a series of five letters that had been brought together by a certain Philippe Hardouyn. These letters were written between 1589-93. Together they complete our understanding of the possible reasons that made Bodin a ligueur. A sixth letter from this same period is Bodin’s notorious letter of 20 January 1590, in which he explains the reasons that made him a supporter of the Catholic League. A couple of letters from the correspondence between Bodin and Walsingham, dating from 1582, have also survived.

9. Influence

As the work’s numerous editions and translations attest, Bodin’s République was widely read in Europe after its publication, up until the mid-seventeenth century. It was subsequently forgotten, however, and Bodin’s influence during the eighteenth century was only marginal. It was not until the twentieth century that his works, slowly, but decisively, began to interest scholars again. Growing interest in his works has assured Bodin the place he deserves among the most important political thinkers of the sixteenth century. New translations and modern editions of his works have made his ideas accessible to wider audiences.

Among Bodin’s best-known ideas is the Theory of Climate that is currently most often associated with another French philosopher, Montesquieu (1689-1755). Bodin’s comparative and empirical approach in the fields of historical methodology, jurisprudence, and religion represented a break with medieval traditions. He was among the most influential legal philosophers of his time, and his Colloquium heptaplomeres is one of the earliest works of comparative religious studies. Bodin’s ideas concerning religious tolerance and the abolition of slavery found an echo among European writers of both the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. Although the Colloquium heptaplomeres remained unpublished until the 1840s, scholars were familiar with its ideas due to manuscript copies that circulated in Europe. The numerous editions of his Démonomanie, on the other hand, testify to an interest previously demonstrated toward his ideas regarding witchcraft. Finally, Bodin’s Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit includes one of the earliest formulations of the Quantity Theory of Money.

In political theory, Bodin’s most influential contribution remains his Theory of Sovereignty, and the conceptualization of sovereign power. A majority of scholars have labeled Bodin as an absolutist. For others, he favored a type of constitutionalism. Still others have observed that he shifted from the perceived constitutionalism of his early writings toward a more absolutist theory in the République. His writings were received in various ways in different parts of Europe, and interpretations regarding them were often contradictory – depending on the country. His Theory of Sovereignty was used by royalists and parliamentarians alike to defend their widely differing opinions. In France, for example, his political theory was largely absorbed into the absolutist movement and the doctrine of the divine right of kings that became highly influential soon after Bodin’s death; one needs only to think of Cardinal Richelieu and Louis XIV. For example, Jacques-Bénigne Bossuet (1627-1704), who was tutor to the oldest son of Louis XIV, argued in favor of an absolute hereditary monarchy from Scriptural sources in his Politics Drawn from the Very Words of Holy Scripture (Politique tirée des propres paroles de l'Écriture sainte). Other French writers who incorporated absolutist elements from Bodin’s theory in their own writings are Pierre Grégoire de Toulouse (c. 1540-1597), Charles Loyseau (1566-1627), and Cardin Le Bret (1558-1655).

The term “monarchomachs” (Fr., monarchomaques) denotes the writers – Protestants or Catholics – who opposed the powers of the monarch. The term was first coined by the Scottish jurist and royalist William Barclay (1546-1608) in his De Regno et Regali Potestate (1600). Similar to what Bodin had done in his République, Barclay defended the rights of kings. Giovanni Botero (1544-1617) was one of the earliest writers to have used the expression “reason of state” (Fr., Raison d’état) in his work Della ragion di Stato (1589). Bodin’s political writings may have been one of the sources used by Botero and his followers.

In Germany, Johannes Althusius (1557-1638) adopted Bodin’s theory of sovereignty in his Politica methodice digesta (1603), but argued that the community is always sovereign. In this sense, every commonwealth – no matter what its form may be – is popular. Dutch jurist Hugo Grotius published his renowned De jure belli ac pacis in 1625; Grotius does not conceal his admiration for Bodin, nor for the method used by French writers that consisted of combining the study of history with the study of law.

Bodin’s République was among the works that introduced the idea of legislative sovereignty in England. His considerable influence upon Elizabethan and Jacobean political thought in England, one scholar has observed, was largely due to his precise definition of sovereignty. Among the political writers who defended the powers of the king, Sir Robert Filmer (c. 1588-1653) drew heavily upon Bodin’s writings. One shorter text, in particular, The Necessity of the Absolute Power of all Kings and in particular of the King of England,  published in 1648, is hardly anything more than a collection of ideas expressed in the République. John Locke’s First Treatise of Government (1689) may, therefore, be considered not only a refutation of Filmer’s political ideas, but also a critical commentary upon Bodin’s political theory. Thomas Hobbes, in his The Elements of Law (1640), cites Bodin by name and approves Bodin’s opinion according to which sovereign power in the commonwealth may not be divided (II.8.7. “Of the Causes of Rebellion”). This principle of indivisible sovereign power is also expressed in Hobbes’ later political works De cive (1642) and Leviathan (1651).

10. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Oppiani De venatione (1555)
  • Oratio de instituenda iuventute… (1559)
  • Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem (1566)
  • La réponse aux paradoxes de Malestroit (1568)
  • La harangue de Messire Charles des Cars (1573)
  • Les Six Livres de la République (1576; all references in this article are to the edition of 1583)
  • Apologie de Réne Herpin pour la République (before 1581)
  • Recueil de tout ce qui s’est négocié en la compagnie du tiers état… (1577)
  • Juris universi distributio (1578)
  • De la démonomanie des sorciers (1580)
  • De republica libri sex (1586)
  • Sapientiae moralis epitome (1588)
  • Paradoxon (1596)
  • Universae naturae theatrum (1596)
  • Consilia de principe recte instituendo (1602)
  • Colloquium heptaplomeres (1841)
  • Epître de Jean Bodin touchant l’institution de ses Enfans de 1586 (1841)

i. Modern Editions of Bodin’s works

1. Collected Works
  • Bodin, Jean. Oeuvres philosophiques de Jean Bodin. Ed. Pierre Mesnard. Trans. Pierre Mesnard.  Paris: PUF, 1951.
    • Includes the following Latin works, together with their French translations: Oratio de instituenda in repub. juventute ad senatum populumque tolosatemJuris universi distributio, and Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem.
  • Bodin, Jean. Selected Writings on Philosophy, Religion and Politics. Ed. Paul L. Rose. Genève: Droz, 1980.
    • Includes the following seven works: Bodin’s letter to his nephew (1586), Consilium de institutione principis (1574-86), Sapientia moralis epitome (1588), Latin dedicatory letter to the Paradoxon quod nec virtus ulla in mediocritate nec summum hominis bonum in virtutis actione consistere possit (1596) and the French translation of the text, Le Paradoxe de Jean Bodin Angevin (1598), Bodin’s letter to Jean Bautru des Matras (1560s), as well as a letter to a friend in which he gives reasons for supporting the Catholic League (1590).
2. Individual Works
  • Bodin, Jean. Method for the Easy Comprehension of History. Trans. Beatrice Reynolds. New York: Columbia University Press, 1945.
    • Includes an introduction by Reynolds.
  • Bodin, Jean. Six Books of the Commonwealth. Abr. ed. Trans. Marian J. Tooley. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1955.
    • An abridgment of Bodin’s major work, together with an introduction.
  • Bodin, Jean. The Six Bookes of a Commonweal. Trans. Richard Knolles. Ed. Kenneth Douglas McRae. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1962.
    • This is the only existing full English translation of the work; facsimile reprint of Knolles’ English translation of 1606 that compares the French and Latin versions of the text. McRae’s introductory material discusses Bodin’s life, his career and his influence.
  • Bodin, Jean. Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on Education of Youth in the Commonwealth. Trans. George Albert Moore. Chevy Chase, Md: Country Dollar Press, 1965.
    • Moore’s translation of an important and interesting early text by Bodin.
  • Bodin, Jean. Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime. Trans. Marion Leathers Kuntz. Princeton, N. J.: Princeton University Press, 1975. Second edition. University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2008.
    • First complete modern translation of the work, together with highly informative introductory material.
  • Bodin, Jean. On Sovereignty. Trans. Julian H. Franklin. Ed. Julian H. Franklin. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992.
    • Contains chapters 8 and 10 of the First book, and chapters 1 and 5 of the Second book of the République. Concentrates on Bodin’s analysis of sovereignty. Franklin’s textual notes are informative.
  • Bodin, Jean. Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit. Trans. Henry Tudor. Eds. Henry Tudor and R. W. Dyson. Bristol: Thoemmes Continuum, 1997.
    • Most recent English translation of the text, it is based on the first edition of the work, but also included are the major changes that occurred between the first (1568) and second (1578) editions. Includes a concise and useful introduction.
  • Bodin, Jean. On the Demon-Mania of Witches. Abr. ed. Trans. Randy A. Scott and Jonathan L. Pearl. Toronto: Centre for Reformation and Renaissance Studies, 2001.
    • Abridged translation of Bodin’s Démonomanie that contains about two-thirds of the original text and informative notes.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Blair, Ann. The Theater of Nature. Jean Bodin and Renaissance Science. Princeton, N. J.: Princeton University Press, 1997.
    • Indispensable study concerning the methods and practices of Renaissance science in the light of Bodin’s Theatrum.
  • Brown, John L. The Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem of Jean Bodin. Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 1939. Reprint. New York: AMS Press, 1969.
    • Central study that analyses the background and influence of Bodin’s Methodus. Brown establishes that Bodin’s earlier work contains many of the political and legal principles that were further developed in the République.
  • Franklin, Julian H. Jean Bodin and the Rise of Absolutist Theory. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1973.
    • An influential study on the topic of the formation of Bodin’s absolutist view, as it is expressed in the République.
  • Heller, Henry. “Bodin on Slavery and Primitive Accumulation.” The Sixteenth Century Journal 25.1 (1994): 53-65.
    • Argues that Bodin conceived of slavery not only as something irrational and unnatural, but as a permanent threat to the stability of the state.
  • McRae, Kenneth D. “Ramist Tendencies in the Thought of Jean Bodin.” Journal of the History of Ideas 16.3 (1955): 306-323.
    • Argues that several of Bodin’s writings reveal the influence of Ramist concepts; even the République (in which the Ramist influence is less evident) can be described as Ramist in its structure.
  • O’Brien, Denis P. “Bodin’s Analysis of Inflation.” History of Political Economy 32.2 (2000): 267-292.
    • A longer version of the introduction that O’Brien wrote to the 1997 edition of Bodin’s Response. Argues that Bodin should be regarded as the pioneer formulator of the quantity theory of money.
  • Pearl, Jonathan L. “Humanism and Satanism: Jean Bodin’s Contribution to the Witchcraft Crisis.” Canadian Review of Sociology and Anthropology 19.4 (1982): 541-548.
    • On Bodin’s influence on the “witchcraft crisis”. Pearl reminds us that the Renaissance witnessed, not only a revival of the arts and the birth of modern science, but also the re-appearance of the occult: magic, astrology and witchcraft.
  • Remer, Gary. “Dialogues of Toleration: Erasmus and Bodin.” Review of Politics 56.2 (1994): 305-336.
    • Examines two different types of dialogues of toleration; Erasmus' common truth and Bodin's subjective. Erasmus’ traditional conception aims at the discovery of truth in religious questions; Bodin’s conception, on the contrary, does not presuppose that a common truth may be discovered, since every opinion is one part of the truth.
  • Rose, Paul Lawrence. Bodin and the Great God of Nature. The Moral and Religious Universe of a Judaiser. Genève: Droz, 1980.
    • A valuable study concerning Bodin’s ideas on religion and ethics; many of Bodin’s less-known works are considered. Rose argues that Bodin went through three religious conversions in his lifetime.
  • Salmon, John Hearsey McMillan. “The Legacy of Jean Bodin: Absolutism, Populism or Constitutionalism?” The History of Political Thought 17. Thorverton (1996): 500-522.
    • Discusses the ways in which Bodin’s ideas were understood and transformed in France’s neighboring countries during the seventeenth century.
  • Tooley, Marian J. “Bodin and the Mediaeval Theory of Climate.” Speculum 28.1 (1953): 64-83.
    • A scholarly investigation of Bodin’s medieval predecessors regarding the theory of climates. Argues that contrary to his predecessors, Bodin was more interested in the practical implications of the things he observed.
  • Ulph, Owen. “Jean Bodin and the Estates-General of 1576.” Journal of Modern History 19.4 (1947): 289-296.
    • Examines Bodin’s role, as deputy from the bailiwick of Vermandois, during the estates-general at Blois in 1576.
  • Wolfe, Martin. “Jean Bodin on Taxes: The Sovereignty-Taxes Paradox.” Political Science Quarterly 83.2 (1968): 268-284.
    • Argues that Bodin’s main objective in writing about taxes was to push for reform in France’s fiscal system.

i. Bibliography

  • Couzinet, Marie-Dominique, ed. Jean Bodin. Roma: Memini, 2001.
    • Indispensable for conducting serious research on Bodin. Contains references to over 1,500 articles, books and other documents.

ii. Conference proceedings and Article Collections

  • Denzer, Horst, ed. Jean Bodin – Proceedings of the International Conference on Bodin in Munich. München: C.H. Beck, 1973.
    • Fine collection of twenty-four articles (in English, French and German) by the foremost Bodin scholars. Part II contains discussions, and part III an exhaustive bibliography on Bodin from the year 1800 onwards.
  • Franklin, Julian H., ed. Jean Bodin. Aldershot: Ashgate, 2006.
    • Collection of twenty previously published articles or book chapters (in English).

 

Author Information

Tommi Lindfors
Email: tommi.lindfors@helsinki.fi
University of Helsinki
Finland

Austin, John Langshaw

John Langshaw Austin (1911—1960)

J. L. Austin was one of the more influential British philosophers of his time, due to his rigorous thought, extraordinary personality, and innovative philosophical method. According to John Searle, he was both passionately loved and hated by his contemporaries. Like Socrates, he seemed to destroy all philosophical orthodoxy without presenting an alternative, equally comforting, orthodoxy.

Austin is best known for two major contributions to contemporary philosophy: first, his ‘linguistic phenomenology’, a peculiar method of philosophical analysis of the concepts and ways of expression of everyday language; and second, speech act theory, the idea that every use of language carries a performative dimension (in the well-known slogan, “to say something is to do something”). Speech act theory has had consequences and import in research fields as diverse as philosophy of language, ethics, political philosophy, philosophy of law, linguistics, artificial intelligence and feminist philosophy.

This article describes Austin’s linguistic method and his speech act theory, and it describes the original contributions he made to epistemology and philosophy of action. It closes by focusing on two main developments of speech act theory─the dispute between conventionalism and intentionalism, and the debate on free speech, pornography, and censorship.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Method
  2. Philosophy of Language
    1. Meaning and Truth
    2. Speech Acts
  3. Epistemology
    1. Sense and Sensibilia
    2. Other Minds
      1. Knowledge of Particular Empirical Facts
      2. Knowledge of Someone Else’s Mental States
  4. Philosophy of Action
  5. Legacy
    1. Speech Act Theory
      1. Conventionalism and Intentionalism
      2. Free Speech and Pornography
    2. Epistemology
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Method

John Langshaw Austin, born on March 26th 1911 in Lancaster, England. He was trained as a classicist at Balliol College Oxford. He first came to philosophy by studying Aristotle, who deeply influenced his own philosophical method. He also worked on the philosophy of Leibniz and translated Frege’s Grundlagen. Austin spent his whole academic life in Oxford, where he was White’s Professor of Moral Philosophy from 1952 until his death in 1960. During the Second World War Austin was commissioned in the Intelligence Corps, and played a leading role in the organization of D-Day, leaving the British Army in 1945 with the rank of Lt. Colonel. Austin published only seven articles. According to Searle, Austin’s reluctance to publish was partly characteristic of his own attitude, but also it was part of the culture of Oxford at the time: “Oxford had a long tradition of not publishing during one’s lifetime, indeed it was regarded as slightly vulgar to publish” (Searle 2001, 227). Most of Austin’s work was thus published posthumously, and includes a collection of papers (Austin 1961), and two series of lectures reconstructed by the editors on the basis of Austin’s lecture notes: the lectures on perception, edited by Geoffrey Warnock (Austin 1962a), and the William James Lectures held at Harvard in 1955, devoted to speech acts, and edited by James O. Urmson (Austin 1962b) for the first edition, and by Urmson and Marina Sbisa for the second (Austin 1975).

Austin had a profound dissatisfaction not only with the traditional way of philosophizing, but also with Logical Positivism (whose leading figure in Oxford was Alfred J. Ayer). In particular, his dissatisfaction was directed towards a way of practicing philosophy which, in Austin’s view, was responsible for the production of tidy dichotomies, and instead of clarifying the problems at issue, seemed to lead to oversimplifications and dogmatic and preconceived schemes of thought. Austin thus developed a new philosophical methodology and style, which became paradigmatic of Ordinary Language Philosophy. Austin does not claim that this method is the only correct method to adopt. Rather, it represents a valuable preliminary approach to at least some of the most stubborn problems in the tradition of Western philosophy, such as those of freedom, responsibility, and perception. According to Austin, the starting point in philosophy should be the analysis of the concepts and ways of expression of everyday language, and the reconnaissance of our ordinary language. This would help to dismantle the ‘philosophical mistakes’ induced by the way philosophers use certain ordinary words, on the one hand, and, on the other, to gain access to actual features in the world picked out by the expressions we use to describe it.

Ordinary language is not the last word: in principle it can everywhere be supplemented and improved upon and superseded. Only remember, it is the first word. [Austin 1956a/1961, 185]

According to Austin, in ordinary language are deposited all the distinctions and connections established by human beings, as if our words in their daily uses “had stood up to the long test of the survival of the fittest” (Austin 1956a/1961, 182). It is necessary, first of all, to carefully consider the terminology available to us, by making a list of the expressions relevant to the domain at issue: a sort of ‘linguistic phenomenology’ carried out with the help of the dictionary and of the imagination, by searching for combinations of expressions and synonyms, devising linguistic thought-experiments and unusual contexts and scenarios, and speculating about our linguistic reactions to them. The examination of ordinary language enables us to pay attention to the richness of linguistic facts and to tackle philosophical problems from a fresh and unprejudiced perspective.

To be sure, this is not a new methodology in the history of philosophy. Still, this strategy is now carried out with distinctive meticulousness and on a large scale on the one hand, and is undertaken and evaluated collectively, so as to gain a reasonable consensus, on the other. For Austin, philosophy is not an endeavor to be pursued privately, but a collective labor. This was in fact the gist of Austin’s “Saturday mornings,” weekly meetings held during term at Oxford and attended by philosophers of language, moral philosophers and jurists. Austin’s method was better meant for philosophical discussion and research along these lines than for publication: we can nonetheless fully appreciate it in How to Do Things with Words (1962b), and in papers like “A Plea for Excuses” (1956a), and “Ifs and Cans” (1956b).

Austin’s method has been regarded by some as pedantic, as a mere insistence that all we must do is use our words carefully, with no genuine interest in the phenomena which arouse our philosophical worries. There are indeed limitations to his methodology: on the one hand, many philosophical questions still remain untouched even after a meticulous reformulation; on the other hand, our everyday language does not embody all the distinctions which could be relevant for a philosophical inquiry (compare Searle 2001, 228-229). But Austin is far from being concerned merely by language: his focus is always also on the phenomena talked about – as he says, “It takes two to make a truth” (Austin 1950/1961, 124fn; compare Martin 2007).

2. Philosophy of Language

a. Meaning and Truth

With the help of his innovative methodology, Austin takes a new stance towards our everyday language. As is well known, philosophers and logicians like Gottlob Frege, Bertrand Russell, the earlier Ludwig Wittgenstein, Alfred Tarski and Willard Quine want to build a perfect language for philosophical and scientific communication, that is, an artificial language devoid of all the ambiguities and imperfections that characterize natural languages. Conversely, ordinary language philosophers (besides Austin, the later Wittgenstein, Friedrich Waismann, Paul Grice, Peter Strawson) view natural language as an autonomous object of analysis – and its apparent imperfections as signs of richness and expressive power.

In a formal language, semantic conventions associate with each term and each sentence a fixed meaning, once and for all. By contrast, the expressions of a natural language seem essentially incomplete; as a result, it seems impossible to fully verify our everyday sentences. The meanings of our terms are only partially constrained, depending on the beliefs, desires, goals, activities, and institutions of our linguistic community. The boundaries, even when temporarily fixed, are unstable and open to new uses and new conventions in unusual situations. In "The Meaning of a Word," Austin takes into consideration different contexts of utterance of sentences containing familiar terms, in order to create unusual occasions of use: extraordinary or strange cases are meant to contrast with our intuitions and reveal moments of tension hidden in natural language. What are we to say about “It's a goldfinch” uttered about a goldfinch that "does something outrageous (explodes, quotes Mrs. Woolf, or what not)"? (Austin 1940/1961, 88). Austin’s main point is that it is in principle impossible to foresee all the possible circumstances which could lead us to modify or retract a sentence. Our everyday terms are extremely flexible, and can still be used in odd cases. Concerning “That man is neither at home nor not at home,” Austin writes: "Somehow we cannot see what this 'could mean' – there are no semantic conventions, explicit or implicit, to cover this case: yet it is not prohibited in any way – there are no limiting rules about what we might or might not say in extraordinary cases" (Austin 1940/1961, 68). Of a dead man, lying on his bed, what would we say? That he is at home? That he is not at home?

Similarly, should the utterance “France is hexagonal” be taken as true or false? According to Austin we must take into consideration the speaker’s goals and intentions, the circumstances of utterance, and the obligations we undertake in asserting something. Assertions are not simply true or false, but more or less objective, adequate, exaggerated, and rough: “‘true’ and ‘false’ […] do not stand for anything simple at all; but only for a general dimension of being a right or proper thing to say as opposed to a wrong thing, in these circumstances, to this audience, for these purposes and with these intentions” (Austin 1975, 145).

b. Speech Acts

Austin’s most celebrated contribution to contemporary philosophy is his theory of speech acts, presented in How to Do Things with Words (Austin 1975). While for philosophers interested mainly in formal languages the main function of language is describing reality, representing states of affairs and making assertions about the world, for Austin our utterances have a variety of different uses. A similar point is made in Philosophical Investigations by Wittgenstein, who underlines the “countless” uses we may put our sentences to (Wittgenstein 1953: § 23). Austin contrasts the “desperate” Wittgensteinian image of the countless uses of language with his accurate catalogue of the various speech acts we may perform – a taxonomy similar to the one employed by an entomologist trying to classify the many (but not countless) species of beetles.

Not all utterances, then, are assertions concerning states of affairs. Take Austin’s examples

(1) I name this ship the ‘Queen Elisabeth’

as uttered in the course of the launching of a ship, or

(2) I bet you sixpence it will rain tomorrow.

The utterer of (1) or (2) is not describing the launching ceremony or a bet, but doing it. By uttering these sentences we bring about new facts, “as distinguished from producing consequences in the sense of bringing about states of affairs in the ‘normal’ way, that is, changes in the natural course of events” (Austin 1975: 117): by uttering (1) or (2) we modify the social reality, institute new conventions, and undertake obligations. In the first lessons of How to Do Things with Words, Austin traces a tentative distinction between constatives and performatives, to be abandoned in the subsequent lessons. Constatives, on the one hand, are sentences like

(3) The cat is on the mat:

they aim to describe states of affairs and are assessable as true or false. Performatives like (1) and (2), on the other hand, do rather than report something: they perform acts governed by norms and institutions (such as the act of marrying or baptizing) or social conventions (such as the act of betting or promising) and do not seem assessible as true or false. This last controversial claim is not argued for (“I assert this as obvious and do not argue it,” Austin 1975, 6): the claim is only provisional and subject to revision in the light of later sections (Austin 1975, 4n).

According to Austin it is possible and fruitful to shed light on standard cases of successful communication, and to specify the conditions for the smooth functioning of a performative, by focusing on non-standard cases and communicative failures. As we have said, performatives cannot be assessed as true or false, but they are subject to different types of invalidity or failure, called “infelicities.” In some cases the attempt to perform an act fails or “misfires.” The act is “null and void” on the basis of the violation of two kinds of rules:

A.1: there must exist an accepted conventional procedure having a certain conventional effect, that procedure to include the uttering of certain words by certain persons in certain circumstances;

A.2: that procedure must be invoked in adequate circumstances and by appropriate persons.

Further infelicities concern the execution of the procedure, for it must be executed by all participants both

B.1: correctly, and

B.2: completely.

Finally, there are cases in which the performance of an act is achieved, but there is an abuse of the procedure, due to the violation of two kinds of rules:

C.1: the procedure must be executed by the speaker with appropriate thoughts, feelings or intentions;

C.2: the participants must subsequently conduct themselves in accordance with the procedure performed.

As we said, in How to Do Things with Words Austin draws the distinction between constatives and performatives merely as a preliminary to the presentation of his main thesis, namely that there is a performative dimension in any use of language. The putative class of performatives seems to admit only specific verbs (like to promise, to bet, to apologize, to order), all in the first person singular present. Any attempt to characterize the class with grammatical or lexical criteria, however, is bound to fail. We may in fact perform the act of, say, ordering by using an explicit performative, as in

(4) I order you to close the door

but also with

(5) Close the door!

Similarly, there are performative verbs also for acts of stating, asserting, or concluding, as in

(6) I assert that the Earth is flat.

The very distinction between utterances assessable along the dimension of truth and falsehood (constatives) and utterances assessable along the dimension of felicity or infelicity (performatives) is a mere illusion. To show this, Austin presents two arguments:

a) on the one hand, constatives may be assessed as happy or unhappy: like performatives, assertions require appropriate conditions for their felicitous performance (to give an example, it does not seem appropriate to make an assertion one does not believe);

b) on the other hand, performatives may be assessed in terms of truth and falsehood, or in terms of some conformity to the facts: of a verdict we say that it is fair or unfair, of a piece of advice that it is good or bad, of praise that it is deserved or not.

By a) and b) Austin is led to the conclusion that the distinction between constatives and performatives is inadequate: all sentences are tools we use in order to do something – to say something is always to do something. Therefore it is necessary to develop a general theory of the uses of language and of the acts we perform by uttering a sentence: a general theory of what Austin calls illocutionary force.

Within the same total speech act Austin distinguishes three different acts: locutionary, illocutionary and perlocutionary.

  • The locutionary act is the act of saying something, the act of uttering certain expressions, well-formed from a syntactic point of view and meaningful. It may furthermore be analyzed into a phonetic act (the act of uttering certain noises), a phatic act (the act of uttering words, that is, sounds as conforming to a certain vocabulary and grammar), and a rhetic act (the act of using these words with a certain meaning – sense or reference).
  • To perform a locutionary act is also and eo ipso to perform an illocutionary act (Austin 1975, 98). An illocutionary act is a way of using language, and its performance is the performance of an act in saying something as opposed to performance of an act of saying something. It corresponds to the force that an utterance like (5) has in a particular context: order, request, entreaty, or challenge.
  • The perlocutionary act corresponds to the effects brought about by performing an illocutionary act, to its consequences (intentional or non-intentional) on the feelings, thoughts, or actions of the participants. According to Austin the speaker, by saying what she says, performs another kind of act (like persuading, convincing, or alerting) because she can be taken as responsible for those effects (compare Sbisa 2006 and 2013). Yet the perlocutionary consequences of illocutionary acts are non-conventional, not being completely under the speaker’s control, but rather related to the specific circumstances in which the act is performed. Austin makes a further distinction between perlocutionary objects (the consequences brought about by an illocutionary act in virtue of its force – as alerting can be a consequence of the illocutionary act of warning) and perlocutionary sequels (the consequences brought about by an illocutionary act without a systematic connection to its force – as surprising can be a consequence of the illocutionary act of asserting) (Austin 1975: 118).

In the last lesson of How to Do Things with Words Austin tentatively singles out five classes of illocutionary acts, using as a starting point a list of explicit performative verbs: Verdictives, Exercitives, Commissives, Behabitives, Expositives.

  • The class of Verdictives includes acts (formal or informal) of giving a verdict, estimate, or appraisal (as acquitting, reckoning, assessing, diagnosing). These may concern facts or values.
  • The class of Exercitives includes acts of exerting powers, rights or influence (as appointing, voting, ordering, warning). These presuppose that the speaker has a certain kind of authority or influence.
  • The class of Commissives includes acts that commit the speaker to doing something (as promising, undertaking, consenting, opposing, betting).
  • The class of Expositives includes acts that clarify reasons, arguments, or communications (as affirming, denying, stating, describing, asking, answering).
  • The class of Behabitives includes acts having to do with attitudes and social behavior (as apologizing, congratulating, commending, thanking). These include reactions to other people’s behavior or fortune, and are particularly vulnerable to insincerity (condition C.1).

Austin characterizes the illocutionary act as the conventional aspect of language (to be contrasted with the perlocutionay act). As we said before, for any speech act there must exist an accepted conventional procedure having a certain conventional effect (condition A.1): if the conventional procedure is executed according to further conditions, the act is successfully performed. This claim seems plausible as far as institutional or social acts (like naming a ship, or betting) are concerned: the conventional dimension is here manifest because it is our society (and sometimes our laws) that validates those acts. The claim seems less plausible as far as speech acts in general are concerned: nothing conventional, or semantic, makes of (5) an order, or a challenge, or an entreaty – the illocutionary force of the utterance is fixed by the context of utterance. More generally, according to Austin the speaker’s intentions play only a minor role in the performance of a speech act (violation of condition C.1 leads to an abuse of the procedure, but not to a failure of the speech act). Drawing on Gricean ideas, Peter Strawson argues that what makes of (5) an illocutionary act of ordering instead of entreating are the speaker’s intentions – intentions the speaker may (but need not) make available to the audience using linguistic conventions:

I do not want to deny that there may be conventional postures or procedures for entreating… But I do want to deny that an act of entreaty can be performed only as conforming to some such conventions. What makes X's words to Y an entreaty not to go is something complex enough, no doubt relating to X's situation, attitude to Y, manner, and current intention. [Strawson 1964, 444; compare Warnock 1973 and Bach & Harnish 1979]

Marina Sbisa disagrees with Strawson’s reading of the conventionality of illocutionary acts and identifies two distinct claims in Austin’s conventionalism: (a) illocutionary acts are performed via conventional devices (like linguistic conventions); and (b) illocutionary acts produce conventional effects. Austin specifies three kinds of conventional effects: the performance of an illocutionary act involves the securing of uptake, that is, bringing about the understanding of the meaning and force of the locution; the illocutionary act takes effect in conventional ways, as distinguished from producing consequences in the sense of bringing about changes in the natural course of events; and many illocutionary acts invite by convention a response or sequel (Austin 1975, 116-117). According to Sbisa, Austin deals too briefly with the conventionality of the effects produced by illocutionary acts (b) as opposed to the conventionality of the devices by which we perform illocutionary acts (a), leaving room for Strawson’s distinction between two groups of illocutionary acts: those depending on some convention the speaker follows, and those depending on a particular kind of intention of the speaker (Sbisa 2013, 26). On this point see below, § 5.a.

3. Epistemology

There are two main examples of Austin’s philosophical method applied to epistemological issues: the paper “Other Minds” (1946), and the series of lectures Sense and Sensibilia, delivered at Oxford and Berkeley during the decade from 1947 to 1958, and published in 1962. “Other Minds” is a paper given in the homonymous symposium at joint sessions of the Mind Association and the Aristotelian Society (John Wisdom, Alfred J. Ayer, and Austin were the main participants), and its topic was a much debated one in the middle decades of the twentieth century. In Sense and Sensibilia Austin applies his linguistic analysis to the sense-data theory and the more general foundational theory of knowledge, within which sense-data played the role of the basis of the very structure of empirical knowledge, in order to gain a clarification of the concept of perception.

a. Sense and Sensibilia

These lectures represent a very detailed criticism of the claims put forward by A. J. Ayer in The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge (1940), and, to a lesser extent, of those contained in H. H. Price’s Perception (1932) and G. J. Warnock’s Berkeley (1953). Austin challenges the sense-data theory, according to which we never directly perceive material objects. On the contrary, it is claimed by such theory, we perceive nothing but sense-data.

The notion of sense-data is introduced to identify the object of perception in abnormal, exceptional cases, for example, refraction, mirages, mirror-images, hallucinations, and so forth. In such cases perceptions can either be ‘qualitatively delusive’ or ‘existentially delusive,’ depending on whether sense-data endow material things with qualities that they do not really possess, or the material things presented do not exist at all. In all such cases, the sense-data theorist maintains, we directly perceive sense-data. The subsequent step in this argument, named the argument from illusion, is to claim that in ordinary cases too we directly perceive merely sense-data.

Austin’s goal is not to answer the question “What are the objects of perception?” Austin aims to get rid of “such illusions as ‘the argument from illusion’” on the one hand, and to offer on the other a “technique for dissolving philosophical worries” by clarifying the meaning of words such as ‘real,’ ‘look,’ ‘appear’ and ‘seem’ (Austin 1962a, 4-5). The argument from illusion amounts to a misconception inasmuch as it introduces a bogus dichotomy: that between sense-data and material objects. Austin challenges this dichotomy, and the subsequent claim that abnormal, illusory perceptions do not differ from normal, veridical ones in terms of quality (in both cases sense-data are perceived, though in different degrees), by presenting different cases of perceptions in order to show that “there is no one kind of thing that we ‘perceive’ but many different kinds, the number being reducible if at all by scientific investigation and not by philosophy” (Austin 1962a, 4).

Besides chairs, tables, pens and cigarettes, indicated by the sense-data theorist as examples of material objects, Austin draws attention to rainbows, shadows, flames, vapors and gases as cases of things we ordinarily say that we perceive, even though we would not classify them as material things. Likewise, Austin argues, there is no single way in which we are ‘deceived by senses’ (that is, to perceive something unreal or not material), but “things may go wrong […] in lots of different ways – which don’t have to be, and must not be assumed to be, classifiable in any general fashion” (Austin 1962a, 13). Moreover, Austin asks whether we would be prone to speak of ‘illusions’ with reference to dreams, phenomena of perspective, photos, mirror-images or pictures on the screen at the cinema. By recalling the familiarity of the circumstances in which we encounter these phenomena and the ways in which we ordinarily consider them, Austin intends to show how the dichotomies between sense-data and material objects, and between illusory perceptions and veridical ones, are in fact spurious alternatives.

The facts of perceptions are “diverse and complicated” and the analysis of words in their contexts of use enables us to make the subtle distinctions obliterated by the “obsession” some philosophers have for certain words (for example, ‘real’ and ‘reality’), and by the lack of attention to the (not even remotely interchangeable) uses of verbs like ‘look,’ ‘appear,’ and ‘seem.’ The way the sense-data theorists use the words ‘real’ and ‘directly’ in the argument from illusion is not the ordinary use of these words, but a new use, which nevertheless fails to be explained. Austin does not want to rule out the possibility of tracing, for theoretical purposes, new distinctions, and thus of emending our linguistic practices by introducing technical terms, but he rather proposes always to pay attention to the ordinary uses of our words, in order to avoid oversimplifications and distortions.

As an example, Austin examines the word ‘real’ and contrasts the ordinary, firmly established meanings of that word as fixed by the everyday ways we use it to the ways it is used by sense-data theorists in their arguments. What Austin recommends is a careful consideration of the ordinary, multifarious meanings of that word in order not to posit, for example, a non-natural quality designed by that word, common to all the things to which that word is attributed (‘real ducks,’ ‘real cream,’ ‘real progress,’ ‘real color,’ ‘real shape,’ and so forth).

Austin highlights the complexities proper to the uses of ‘real’ by observing that it is (i) a substantive-hungry word that often plays the role of (ii) adjuster-word, a word by means of which “other words are adjusted to meet the innumerable and unforeseeable demands of world upon language” (Austin 1962a, 73). Like ‘good,’ it is (iii) a dimension-word, that is, “the most general and comprehensive term in a whole group of terms of the same kind, terms that fulfil the same function” (Austin 1962a, 71): that is, ‘true,’ ‘proper,’ ‘genuine,’ ‘live,’ ‘natural,’ ‘authentic,’ as opposed to terms such as ‘false,’ ‘artificial,’ ‘fake,’ ‘bogus,’ ‘synthetic,’ ‘toy,’ but also to nouns like ‘dream,’ ‘illusion,’ ‘mirage,’ ‘hallucination.’ ‘Real,’ is also (iv) a word whose negative use “wears the trousers” (a trouser-word) (Austin 1962a, 70).

In order to determine the meaning of ‘real’ we have to consider, case by case, the ways and contexts in which it is used. Only by doing so, according to Austin, can we avoid introducing false dichotomies (for a criticism of Austin’s attack on sense-data see Ayer 1967 and Smith 2002).

b. Other Minds

In this paper Austin tackles the philosophical problems of the possibility of knowing someone else’s mental states (for example, that another man is angry) and of the reliability of the reasons to which we appeal when we justify our assertions about particular empirical facts (for example, that the bird moving around my garden is a goldfinch). The target of Austin’s analysis is the skeptical outcome of the challenge of such a possibility on the part of certain philosophers (in this case Austin is addressing some of John Wisdom’s contentions). As to the knowledge of particular empirical facts, given that “human intellect and senses are, indeed, inherently fallible and delusive” (Austin 1946/1961, 98), the skeptic claims that we should never, or almost never, say that we know something, except for what I can perceive with my senses now, for example, “Here is something that looks red to me now.” On the other hand, the possibility of knowing someone else’s mental states is challenged by means of the idea of a privileged access to our own sensations and mental states, such that only about them can we not ‘be wrong’ “in the most favoured sense” (Austin 1946/1961, 90).

i. Knowledge of Particular Empirical Facts

Austin engages in an examination of the kinds of answers we would provide, in ordinary, concrete and specific circumstances, to challenges to our claims of knowledge. For instance, in responding to someone’s question, “How do you know?” in the face of my claim “That is a goldfinch,” my answer could appeal to my past experience, by virtue of which I have learned something about goldfinches, and hence to the criteria for determining that something is a goldfinch, or to the circumstances of the current case, which enable me to determine that the bird moving around my garden now is a goldfinch. The ways in which, in ordinary circumstances, our claims can be challenged, or be wrong, are specific (ways that the context helps us to determine), and there are recognized procedures appropriate to the particular type of case to which we can appeal to justify or verify such claims.

The precautions to take, in ordinary cases, in order to claim to know something “cannot be more than reasonable, relative to current intents and purposes” (Austin 1946/1961, 88), inasmuch as in order to suppose that one is mistaken there must be some concrete reason relative to the specific case. On the contrary, the “wile of the metaphysician,” Austin claims, amounts to phrasing her doubts and questions in a very general way, and “not specifying or limiting what may be wrong,” “so that I feel at a loss ‘how to prove’” what she has challenged (Austin 1946/1961, 87).

By drawing a parallel with the performative formula ‘I promise,’ Austin claims that in uttering ‘I know’ the speaker does not describe her mental state (this would be, in Austin’s terms, a descriptive fallacy). Rather, in the appropriate circumstances, she does something: she gives others her word, that is, her authority for saying that ‘S is P.’

Austin’s analysis of the epistemological terms in their ordinary, specific uses is meant to determine the conditions under which our claims are felicitous, successful speech acts. These conditions are the ones we typically appeal to in order to justify our claims of knowledge should they be challenged.

Whether Austin’s strategy proves to be successful against the skeptical challenge, which rests on a metaphysical and logical possibility, is a further issue to be resolved.

ii. Knowledge of Someone Else’s Mental States

Austin objects to the idea (as claimed for example, by Wisdom) that we know (if ever we do) someone else’s feelings only from the physical symptoms of these feelings: we never know someone else’s feelings in themselves, as we know our own. According to Austin, claims about someone else’s mental states can be tackled like those about particular empirical facts, even though the former are more complex, owing to “the very special nature (grammar, logic) of feelings” (Austin 1946/1961, 105). It is on this special nature that the analysis of Austin in this paper is meant to shed light.

To affirm of someone, ‘I know he is angry,’ requires, on the one hand, a certain familiarity with the person to whom we are attributing the feeling; in particular, familiarity in situations of the same type as the current one. On the other hand, it seems to be necessary to have had a first-person experience of the relevant feeling/emotion.

A feeling (say anger), Austin claims, presents a close connection both with its natural expressions/manifestations, and with the natural occasions of those manifestations, so that “it seems fair to say that ‘being angry’ is in many respects like ‘having mumps’. It is a description of a whole pattern of events, including occasion, symptoms, feeling and manifestation, and possibly other factors besides” (Austin 1946/1961, 109).

Against Wisdom’s claim that we never get at someone else’s anger, but only at the symptoms/signs of his anger, Austin draws attention to the ways we talk about others’ feelings, and highlights the general pattern of events “peculiar to the case of ‘feelings’ (emotions)” on which our attributions are based (Austin 1946/1961, 110). Moreover, emphasis is placed on the fact that in order for feelings and emotions to be attributed, and also self-attributed, a problem of recognition, and of familiarity with the complexities of such pattern, seems to be in place, due to the very way in which the uses of the relevant terms have been learnt.

Emotion terms, for their part, are vague, for, on the one hand, they are often applied to a wide range of situations, while on the other, the patterns they cover are rather complex, such that in “unorthodox” cases there may be hesitation in attribution. Apart from this kind of intrinsic vagueness, doubts may arise as to the correctness of a feeling attribution, or its authenticity, due to cases of misunderstanding or deception. But these cases are special ones, and there are, as in the goldfinch case, “established procedures” for dealing with them.

Unlike the goldfinch case, in which “sensa are dumb” (Austin 1946/1961, 97), in the case of feeling attribution a special place is occupied, within its complex pattern of events, by “the man’s own statement as to what his feelings are” (Austin 1946/1961, 113). According to Austin, “believing in other persons, in authority and testimony, is an essential part of the act of communicating, an act which we all constantly perform. It is as much an irreducible part of our experience as, say, giving promises, or playing competitive games, or even sensing coloured patches” (Austin 1946/1961, 115). Austin thus aims at blocking the skeptical argument by claiming that the possibility of knowing others’ states of minds and feelings is a constitutive feature of our ordinary practices as such, for which there is no “justification” (ibid.). Again, it may still be open to contention whether this is sufficient to refute skepticism.

4. Philosophy of Action

Austin’s contribution to the philosophy of action is traceable mainly to two papers: “A Plea for Excuses” (1956a) and “Three Ways of Spilling Ink” (1966), where the notions of  ‘doing an action,’ and ‘doing something’ are clarified by means of the linguistic analysis of excuses, that is, by considering “the different ways, and different words, in which on occasion we may try to get out of things, to show that we didn’t act ‘freely’ or were not ‘responsible’” (Austin 1966/1961, 273). According to the method dear to Austin, through the analysis of abnormal cases, or failures, it is possible to throw light on the normal and standard cases. An examination of excuses should enable us to gain an understanding of the notion of action, by means of the preliminary elucidation of the notions of responsibility and freedom.

As for the case of ‘knowing,’ Austin’s contribution is one of clarification of use, which sheds light on the notion of ‘doing an action.’

According to Austin, from the analysis of the modifying expressions occurring in excuses (for example, ‘unwittingly,’ ‘impulsively’) and in accusations (‘deliberately,’ ‘purposely,’ ‘on purpose’), it is possible to classify the different breakdowns affecting actions, and thus to dismantle the complex internal details of the machinery of action. Far from being reducible to merely making some bodily movements, doing an action is organized into different stages: the intelligence, the appreciation of the situation, the planning, the decision, and the execution. Moreover, apart from the stages, “we can generally split up what might be named as one action in several distinct ways, into different stretches or phases” (Austin 1956a/1961, 201). In particular, by using a certain term to describe what someone did, we can cover either a smaller or larger stretch of events, distinguishing the act from its consequences, results, or effects. Austin thus points out that it is crucial to determine ‘what modifies what,’ that is, what is being excused, because of the different possible ways in which it is possible to refer to ‘what she did.’ Depending on the way we delimit the act, we may hold a person responsible or not, hence it is extremely important to determine with precision what is being justified.

In order to ascertain someone’s responsibility for a certain action, for example, a child that has spilled ink in class, it is necessary to consider as distinct cases whether he did it ‘intentionally,’ ‘deliberately,’ or ‘on purpose.’ Austin reveals the differences among the three terms in two steps. First, he considers imaginary actions the description of which presents two of the terms as expressly dissociated: for example, to do something intentionally, but not deliberately (for example, to impulsively stretch out one's hand to make things up at the end of a quarrel; see Austin 1966/1961, 276-277); intentionally, but not on purpose (for example, to act wantonly); deliberately, but not intentionally (for example, unintended, though foreseeable, consequences/results of some actions of mine – to ruin one’s debtor by insisting on payment of due debts; see Austin 1966/1961, 278); and on purpose, but not intentionally (this last case seems to verge on impossibility, and has a paradoxical flavor). The logical limits of these combinations enable Austin to single out the differences among the concepts under investigation. Subsequently, as a second step, such differences are made apparent by an analysis of the grammar and philology of the terms (adjectival terminations, negative forms, the prepositions used to form adverbial expressions, and so forth). From this examination each term turns out to mark different ways in which it is possible to do an action, or different ‘aspects’ of action.

Austin’s analysis of the notions of action and responsibility casts light on that of freedom, which is clarified by the examination of “all the ways in which each action may not be ‘free’” (Austin 1956a/1961, 180). Like the word ‘real,’ also in the case of ‘free’ it is the negative use that wears the trousers: the notion of freedom derives its meaning from the concepts excluded, case by case, by each use of the term ‘free’ (for example, consider the following utterances: “I had to escape, since he threatened me with a knife;” “The glass slipped out of my hand because of my astonishment;” “I can’t help checking the email every five minutes”). By considering the specific, ordinary situations in which it is possible or not to ascertain someone’s responsibility for an act (where an issue of responsibility arises), the notions of freedom and responsibility emerge as closely intertwined. In Austin’s words: “As ‘truth’ is not a name for a characteristic of assertions, so ‘freedom’ is not a name for a characteristic of actions, but a name of a dimension in which actions are assessed” (Austin 1956a/1961, 180). Austin does not provide a positive account of the notion of freedom: it is rather elucidated through attention to the different ways in which our actions may be free.

5. Legacy

a. Speech Act Theory

Since the end of the 1960s Speech Act Theory (SAT) has been developed in many directions. Here we will concentrate on two main strands: the dispute between conventionalism and intentionalism on the one hand, and the debate on pornography, free speech, and censorship on the other.

i. Conventionalism and Intentionalism

Peter Strawson’s contribution to Austin’s SAT, with ideas drawn from Paul Grice’s analysis of the notion of non-natural meaning, marks the beginning of the dispute over the role played by convention and intention respectively in the performance of speech acts. Although almost all the developments of SAT contain, in different degrees, both a conventionalist and an intentionalist element, it may be useful to distinguish two main traditions, depending on the preponderance of one element over the other: a conventionalist, Austinian tradition, and an intentionalist, neo-Gricean one. There are two versions of conventionalism: John Searle’s conventionalism of the means, and Marina Sbisa’s conventionalism of the effects (the distinction is marked by Sbisa).

Central to Searle’s systematization of SAT is the hypothesis that speaking a language amounts to being engaged in a rule-governed activity, and that human languages may be regarded as the conventional realizations of a set of underlying constitutive rules, that is, rules that create, rather than just regulate, an activity, to the effect that the existence of such activity logically depends on that of the rules constituting it. Searle’s analysis aims at specifying a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the successful performance of an illocutionary act (Searle concentrates on the act of promising, but the analysis is further extended to the other types of illocutionary acts, of which several classifications have been developed within SAT). Starting from the felicitous conditions for the performance of an act, a set of semantic rules for the use of ‘the illocutionary force indicating device for that act is extracted. Searle’s position thus qualifies as a conventionalism of the means because the felicitous performance of an illocutionary act obtains thanks to the conformity of the meaning of the utterance used to perform it to the linguistic conventions proper to the language within which the act is performed.

Sbisa developed Austin’s thesis of the conventionality of the illocutionary force by linking it to the second of the three kinds of conventional effects characteristic of the illocutionary act: the production of states of affairs in a way different from natural causation, namely, the production of normative states of affairs, such as obligations, commitments, entitlements, rights, and so forth. According to Sbisa, each type of illocutionary act produces specific conventional effects, which correspond to “assignments to or cancellations from each one of the participants of modal predicates” (Sbisa 2001, 1797), which are conventional insofar as their production depends on intersubjective agreement. The hallmark of such effects is, unlike physical actions, their being liable to annulment, their defeasibility.

The main exemplification of the intentionalist tradition within SAT is the analysis developed by Kent Bach and Robert Harnish. In the opposite direction relative to Searle’s views, Bach and Harnish claim that the link between the linguistic structure of an utterance and the illocutionary act it serves to perform is never semantic, or conventional, but rather inferential.

In order for the illocutionary act to be determined by the hearer, in addition to ‘what is said’ (the semantic content of the utterance), the following are also necessary: the speaker’s illocutionary communicative intention (this intention is reflexive: its fulfillment consists in its being recognized, on the part of the hearer, as intended to be recognized); the contextual beliefs shared by the interlocutors; general beliefs about the communicative situation which play the role of presumptions, that is, expectations about the interlocutor’s behavior which are so basic that they constitute the very conditions of possibility of the communicative exchange (for example, the belief of belonging to the same linguistic community, and that in force to the effect that whenever a member of the community utters an expression, she is doing so with some recognizable illocutionary intent); and, finally, conversational assumptions, drawn from Gricean conversational maxims.

All these elements combine to bring about the inference that enables the hearer to move from the level of the utterance act up to the illocutionary level, going through the locutionary one (note that Bach and Harnish, and Searle himself, part company with Austin in distinguishing the components of the speech act). Bach and Harnish put forward a model, the Speech Act Schema (SAS), which represents the pattern of the inference a hearer follows (and that the speaker intends that she follow) in order to understand the illocutionary act as an act of a certain type (as an order, a promise, an assertion, and so forth).

The merit of the intentionalist analysis offered by Bach and Harnish is that it attempts to integrate SAT within a global account of linguistic communication whose aim is to provide a psychologically plausible account. A shortcoming of this approach seems to be concerned with an essential element of SAT itself: the emphasis put on the normative dimension produced by the performance of speech acts. The intentionalist analysis fails to provide an account of such a normative dimension, since it is maintained that the creation of commitments and obligations is a “moral” question not answerable by SAT. On the other hand, the conventionalist tradition in both its variants seems to show an opposite and equally unsatisfactory tendency. It has in fact been argued, specifically by relevance theorists (see Sperber and Wilson 1995), that the illocutionary level, as identified by SAT, does not effectively play a role in the process of linguistic comprehension. That it does play such a role, as the SAT claims, is an unjustified hypothesis, so runs the relevance theorists’ objection. More generally, this objection urges speech act theorists to confront the cognitive turn in the philosophy of language and linguistics.

ii. Free Speech and Pornography

One more surprising applications of Speech Act Theory concerns the debate on free speech, pornography and censorship (compare Langton 1993, Hornsby 1993, Hornsby & Langton 1998, Saul 2006, Bianchi 2008). Liberal defenders of pornography maintain that pornography – even when violent and degrading – should be protected to defend a fundamental principle: the right to freedom of speech or expression. Conversely, Catharine MacKinnon claims that pornography violates women's right to free speech: more precisely pornography not only causes the subordination and silencing of women, but it also constitutes women’s subordination (a violation of their civil right to equal civil status) and silencing (a violation of their civil right to freedom of speech; MacKinnon 1987). MacKinnon's thesis has been widely discussed and criticized. Rae Langton and Jennifer Hornsby offer a defence of her claim in terms of Austin’s speech act theory: works of pornography can be understood as illocutionary acts of subordinating women or of silencing women. On the one hand, pornography (or at least violent and degrading pornography where women are portrayed as willing sexual objects) subordinates women by ranking them as inferior and legitimizing discrimination against them. On the other hand, pornography silences women by creating a communicative environment that deprives them of their illocutionary potential. The claim that pornography silences women can be analysed along the lines drawn by Austin. According to Langton (1993), one may prevent the performance of a locutionary act by preventing the utterance of certain expressions, using physical violence, institutional norms, or intimidation (locutionary silence). Or one may prevent the performance of a perlocutionary act by disregarding the illocutionary act, even if felicitously achieved (perlocutionary frustration). Or else one may prevent the performance of an illocutionary act by creating a communicative environment that precludes the uptake of the force of the speech act, or the recognition of the speaker’s authority, particularly with respect to women’s refusals of unwanted sex (illocutionary disablement). Indeed in Langton and Hornsby’s perspective, pornography might prevent women from performing the illocutionary act of refusing sex – by contributing to situations where a woman’s ‘No’ is not recognized as a refusal, and rape occurs as a result. Against the protection of pornography as a form of expression (a simple form of locution), Langton and Hornsby argue that pornography does more than simply express: it acts to silence the expressions of women (a form of illocution), thereby restricting their freedom of speech. We are thus confronted with two different, and conflicting, rights or, better, with different people in conflict over the same right, the right to free speech.

b. Epistemology

Austin’s legacy has been taken up in epistemology by individual authors such as Charles Travis (2004), who, with regard to the debate about the nature of perception, claims it to be nonrepresentational, and, along the same lines, by Michael G. F. Martin (2002), who defends a form of nonrepresentational realism.

Austin’s work may be considered as a source of inspiration for contextualism in epistemology, but some scholars tend to resist tracing much affinity by pointing out important differences between Austin’s method and the contextualist approach (see, for example, Baz 2012 and McMyler 2011).

More generally, Mark Kaplan (2000, 2008) has insisted on the necessity of considering our ordinary practices of knowledge attribution as a methodological constraint for epistemology, in order for it to preserve its own intellectual integrity. According to Kaplan, the adoption of an Austinian methodology in epistemology would undermine skeptical arguments about knowledge.

Such an Austinian trend is surely a minority one within the epistemological scenery, but later contributions (Gustafsson and Sørli 2011, Baz 2012) have shown how Austin’s method can play a significant role in dealing with several issues in the contemporary philosophical agenda, in epistemology and philosophy of language in particular.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Austin, John L. 1940. “The Meaning of a Word.” The Moral Sciences Club of the University of Cambridge and the Jowett Society of the University of Oxford. Printed in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 55-75). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1946. “Other Minds.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian SocietySupplementary Volumes 20, 148-187. Reprinted in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 76-116). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1950. “Truth.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian SocietySupplementary Volumes 24, 111-128. Reprinted in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 117-133). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1956a. “A Plea for Excuses.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 57, 1-30. Reprinted in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 175-204). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1956b. “Ifs and Cans.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 42, 109-132. Reprinted in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 205-232). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1961. Philosophical Papers. J. O. Urmson and G. J. Warnock (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1962a. Sense and Sensibilia, G. J. Warnock (ed.). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1962b. How to Do Things with Words. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1966. “Three Ways of Spilling Ink.” The Philosophical Review 75, 427-440. Printed in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 272-287). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1975. How to Do Things with Words, James O. Urmson and Marina Sbisa (eds.). Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2nd edition.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Ayer, Alfred J. 1940. The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge. New York: MacMillan.
  • Ayer, Alfred J. 1967. “Has Austin Refuted the Sense-Datum Theory?” Synthese 17, 117-140.
  • Bach, Kent, and Harnish, Robert M. 1979. Linguistic Communication and Speech Acts. Cambridge: MIT Press.
    • The most important development of Speech Act Theory in an intentionalist/inferentialist framework of linguistic communication.
  • Baz, Avner. 2012. When Words Are Called For: A Defense of Ordinary Language Philosophy. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
    • Arguments against Ordinary Language Philosophy are scrutinized and dismantled, and its general method is applied to the debate about the reliance on intuitions in philosophy, and to that between contextualism and anti-contextualism with respect to knowledge.
  • Berlin, Isaiah, Forguson, Lynd W., Pears, David F., Pitcher, George, Searle, John R., Strawson, Peter F., and Warnock, Geoffrey J. (Eds.). 1973. Essays on J. L. Austin. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Together with Fann 1969, the most important collection of papers on Austin.
  • Bianchi, Claudia. 2008. “Indexicals, Speech Acts and Pornography.” Analysis 68, 310-316.
    • A defense of Langton’s thesis according to which works of pornography can be understood as illocutionary acts of silencing women.
  • Fann, Kuang T. (Ed.). 1969. Symposium on J. L. Austin. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • The standard anthology on Austin’s philosophy, with papers by several of Austin’s colleagues and students.
  • Gustafsson, Martin, and Sørli, Richard. (Eds.). 2011. The Philosophy of J. L. Austin. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A collection of essays, aiming to reassess the importance of Austin’s philosophy by developing his ideas in connection with several issues in the contemporary philosophical agenda, especially in epistemology and philosophy of language.
  • Hornsby, Jennifer. 1993. “Speech Acts and Pornography.” Women’s Philosophy Review 10, 38-45.
  • Hornsby, Jennifer, and Langton, Rae. 1998. “Free Speech and Illocution.” Legal Theory 4, 21-37.
    • An analysis of works of pornography as illocutionary acts of subordinating women, or illocutionary acts of silencing women.
  • Kaplan, Mark. 2000. “To What Must an Epistemology Be True?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 61, 279-304.
  • Kaplan, Mark. 2008. “Austin’s Way with Skepticism.” In John Greco (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Skepticism (pp. 348-371). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Kaplan draws attention to the ordinary practices of knowledge attribution as a methodological constraint epistemology should respect, and as a move that would undermine skeptical arguments about knowledge.
  • Langton, Rae. 1993. “Speech Acts and Unspeakable Acts.” Philosophy and Public Affairs 22, 293-330.
    • A discussion of pornography as a kind of speech act.
  • MacKinnon, Catharine. 1987. “Francis Biddle’s Sister: Pornography, Civil Rights and Speech.” In Catharine MacKinnon (ed.), Feminism Unmodified: Discourses on Life and Law (pp. 163-197). Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
    • A passionate plea against pornography as a violation of women's civil rights.
  • Martin, Michael G. F. 2002. “The Transparency of Experience.” Mind and Language 17, 376-425.
  • Martin, Michael G. F. 2007. “Austin: Sense and Sensibilia Revisited.” London Philosophy Papers, 1-31.
    • Austin’s work on perception is discussed in relation with disjunctive theories of perception (Martin 2007), and a nonrepresentational realist account of perception is put forward (Martin 2002).
  • McMyler, Benjamin. 2011. “Believing What the Man Says about His Own Feelings.” In Martin Gustafsson and Richard Sørli (eds.), The Philosophy of J. L. Austin (pp. 114-145). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Price, Henry H. (1932). Perception. London: Methuen & Co.
  • Saul, Jennifer. 2006. “Pornography, Speech Acts and Context.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 106, 229-248.
    • A criticism of Langton’s thesis.
  • Sbisa, Marina. 2001. “Illocutionary Force and Degrees of Strength in Language Use.” Journal of Pragmatics 33, 1791-1814.
  • Sbisa, Marina. 2006. “Speech Act Theory.” In Jef Verschueren and Jan-Ola Oestman (eds.), Key Notions for Pragmatics: Handbook of Pragmatics Highlights, Volume 1 (pp. 229-244). Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Sbisa, Marina. 2013. “Locution, Illocution, Perlocution.” In Marina Sbisa and Ken Turner (eds.), Pragmatics of Speech Actions: Handbooks of Pragmatics, Volume 2. Berlin: Mouton de Gruyter.
    • An overview of Austin’s distinction and of its reformulations.
  • Sbisa, Marina, and Turner, Ken (Eds.) 2013. Pragmatics of Speech Actions: Handbooks of Pragmatics, Volume 2. Berlin: Mouton de Gruyter.
  • Searle, John. 2001. “J. L. Austin (1911-1960).” In Aloysius P. Martinich and David Sosa (eds.), A Companion to Analytic Philosophy (pp. 218-230). Oxford: Blackwell.
    • A biographical sketch and brief discussion of Austin’s speech act theory.
  • Smith, Arthur D. 2002. The Problem of Perception. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Sperber, Dan, and Wilson, Deirdre. 1986. Relevance: Communication and Cognition. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Chapter 4, §10 presents a criticism of Speech Act Theory.
  • Strawson, Peter F. 1964. “Intention and Convention in Speech Acts.” Philosophical Review 73, 439-460.
    • The paper that first discussed the role of conventional and intentional elements in the performance of speech acts.
  • Travis, Charles. 2004. “The Silence of the Senses.” Mind 113, 57-94.
    • Nonrepresentationalism about perception is defended, along Austin-inspired lines.
  • Warnock, Geoffrey J. 1953. Berkeley. Harmondsworth: Penguin Books.
  • Warnock, Geoffrey J. 1973. “Some Types of Performative Utterances.” In Isaiah Berlin, Lynd W. Forguson, David F. Pears, George Pitcher, John R. Searle, Peter F. Strawson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Essays on J. L. Austin (pp. 69-89). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1953. Philosophical Investigations. Gertrude E. M. Anscombe (trans.). Oxford: Blackwell.
    • A discussion of the countless uses we may put our sentences to.

 

Author Information

Federica Berdini
Email: federica.berdini2@unibo.it
University of Bologna
Italy

and

Claudia Bianchi
Email: claudia.bianchi@unisr.it
Vita-Salute San Raffaele University
Italy

Nozick, Robert: Political Philosophy

Robert Nozick: Political Philosophy 

NozickAlthough Robert Nozick did not consider himself to be primarily a political philosopher, he is best known for his contributions to it. Undoubtedly, Nozick’s work in epistemology and metaphysics (especially with respect to free will and the “closest continuer” theory of personal identity) has had a significant impact on those fields. However, it was the publication of his first book, Anarchy, State and Utopia (1974) that revitalized the political right-wing and set off a firestorm of critical replies and commentaries. While Nozick’s accomplishments reach far beyond the confines of political philosophy, it is safe to say that most recognize him for his work on attempting to provide a justification for the state, setting the limits of government, and trying to convince us that accepting his minimal state could foster a framework for a constellation of communities constituting a sort of utopia.

Anarchy, State and Utopia can also be seen as a critical response to John Rawls’ Theory of Justice, which was published just three years earlier and was considered to be the most robust and sophisticated defense of liberal egalitarianism. Although many credit Rawls for single-handedly rekindling interest in political philosophy, this is likely overstated praise. There is little doubt that Nozick’s systematic criticism of Rawls’ theory of justice and establishment of a rival political theory in Anarchy, State and Utopia also played a major role in bring significant attention back to political philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Libertarianism versus Conservatism and Nozick's Appeal to Capitalists
  3. Anarchy, State and Utopia
    1. An Invisible Hand Justification of the State
    2. Individual Rights and the Nature of the Minimal State
    3. Self-Ownership Argument
    4. Separateness of Persons
    5. The Three Principles of Justice
    6. The Wilt Chamberlain and "Sunset/Yacht Lover" Examples
    7. The Experience Machine
    8. The Lockean Proviso
    9. Utopia
  4. Later Thought on Libertarianism
  5. References and Future Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Robert Nozick was born of Jewish immigrants in Brooklyn, New York in 1938 and died in 2002 of stomach cancer. He was a philosopher of wide-ranging interests who worked in metaphysics, epistemology, decision theory, political philosophy, and value theory more generally. Early in his career, Nozick taught at Princeton and Rockefeller Universities, but he spent the vast majority of his career on the faculty at Harvard. Nozick was unique in his approach to philosophy. While he is most properly thought of as an analytic philosopher, throughout his career he increasingly resisted the usual tactic in the discipline to argue from sure premises to a definite conclusion. Instead, Nozick tried to detail plausible explanatory theories to properly describe phenomena and to provide viable alternatives to conventional wisdom. He thought that the aim of philosophy shouldn’t necessarily be to convince opponents that a particular theory is true. Instead, Nozick saw philosophy as an exploratory venture of making connections between ideas and explaining how things could be as they are. This does not mean that he shirked the responsibility of engaging in rigorous analysis of concepts and when warranted he used technical arguments to make highly sophisticated points. It is also noteworthy that Nozick used work from several disciplines outside of philosophy to enhance his scholarship within it. He incorporated insights from economics, evolutionary biology, Buddhism, and moral psychology to clarify his theoretical work and sometimes ground it in empirical studies.

With respect to political philosophy, Nozick was a right-libertarian, which in short means he accepted the idea that individuals own themselves and have a right to private property. While he argued that the state is legitimate, he thought that only a very scaled-down version that provides security to individuals and protects private property can be justified. Nozick’s version of legitimate government is sometimes called the “nightwatchman” state which underscores what he saw as its essential function: to protect individuals and their private property. This means that to properly respect contracts and resolve property disputes, a judiciary is necessary and with respect to protecting persons and their property, a police force and a military are legitimate and citizens may justifiably be taxed to support these basic functions. However, no more expansive function of the state can be justified according to Nozick, which means that taxation aimed at building funds to be redistributed for welfare purposes (for example, health care, education, poverty relief) are all illegitimate. This is very different from the political theory of his one time Harvard colleague John Rawls. Rawls argued that in addition to protecting the basic liberties, it is legitimate for the state to use its coercive powers (via redistributive taxation) to maximize the position of the least well-off.

2. Libertarianism versus Conservatism and Nozick's Appeal to Capitalists

What Nozick did share with Rawls is that he was part of the liberal political tradition, which places a premium on the individual and opposes the idea that the state’s function is to make its citizens moral. Instead, for liberals in political theory such as both Rawls and Nozick, the state exists to provide the appropriate conditions for individuals to define the good life for themselves (just so long as they don’t impede the ability of others to do the same). Notice that the labels are a bit confusing here. For political theorists “liberal” refers to the political tradition of Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau, and Kant. This is different from what “liberal” means in party politics in America (where “liberal” is associated with the Democratic Party).

Once more, while Nozick has been held up as a champion of conservatives in party politics (especially among fiscal ones) at the time of its publication, Anarchy, State and Utopia is best thought of specifically as a right-libertarian tract. In fact, Nozick’s political ideas diverge quite radically from those thought of as “conservative” in political theory. For example, the usual markings of conservatism in political theory include veneration of custom, trust of long standing traditions, and skepticism of wholesale political reform. Conservative political thinkers also usually insist that authority is crucial because it yields societal stability. However, none of these could plausibly be construed as traits of a Nozickian state. Nozick’s political philosophy does not explicitly refer to custom or tradition at all. In fact, if the result of individuals making consensual decisions happens to lead to radical breaks with the customs and traditions of culture, so much the worse for that culture. There would be nothing illegitimate about these consequences in Nozick’s view.

Nozick’s arguments for merely a “nightwatchman” state suggest that there is nothing particularly interesting about authority in his political theory except as it allows for security of citizens and their property. However, if authority is used to curtail individual freedoms in order to fit some pre-ordained set of societal norms, Nozick would have been vehemently opposed to such intrusion of the state into private lives. He was opposed to any sort of paternalistic legislation. For example, Nozick would have criticized laws prohibiting or restricting the riding of motorcycles without helmets on the ground that the state should not have the right to interfere with an individual’s choice to risk serious injury from accidents. Furthermore, Nozick opposed what might be called the “legislation of morality.” For instance, he would have thought it wrongful for the state to interfere with homosexual couples who want to marry and wish to exercise property rights and provisions with respect to domestic partnerships.

Yet, even with that said, it is clear why Nozick appeals to those who are classified as part of the right in party politics (especially in the United States). Again, there is some confusion to be cleared up with respect to labels. Nozick’s views are amenable to some conservatives as they are called in party politics (that is, those members of the Republican Party in the United States who call themselves fiscal conservatives). First of all, Nozick thought that we have robust property rights and borrowing from John Locke he endorsed the notion that we own ourselves. As Nozick famously asserts, “Individuals have rights, and there are things no person or group may do to them (without violating their rights)” (Nozick, 1974, ix). Capitalists and/or free market supporters will find this attractive since it means that we can sell our labor to whomever we wish and (more importantly) buy it from whoever will consent. Self-ownership, thought Nozick, means that we own our labor. This also allows for legitimate transfer of goods as we own ourselves and through our actions with other items in the world we justifiably come to own them as well. While Nozick doesn’t use this particular argument, his position is consistent with the capitalist idea that our use and manipulation of properly acquired raw materials also seems to confer value onto these items. Free market advocates endorse much of Locke’s theory of just property acquisition and Nozick, despite recognizing some possible criticisms of this position seems to end up implicitly accepting important components of it.

Furthermore, Nozick’s insistence that one may legitimately transfer her property any way she wishes just so long as no one is coerced or defrauded is very friendly to the views of free market economists. It is significant to note that Nozick thought these transfers to be legitimated without any consideration of whether the recipients deserve the acquisition of goods. While it is true that free market advocates tend to proclaim the idea that entrepreneurs have an additional claim to profits because they deserve them due to effort, contribution to society, and acceptance of risk, they still share with Nozick the fundamental principle that property owners possess absolute property rights. In sum, the implication of robust property rights – that freedom has a great deal to do with what one may do with his or her property without state interference – is a strongly shared notion of Nozick and capitalists.

Another area of agreement between capitalists and Nozick continues the theme of the limited role of governmental action, this time involving a disavowal of redistributive taxation. Nozick thinks individual rights are so strong that his theory will require significant constraints on state action vis-à-vis individuals. For him, the state’s proper purview is protection of persons and their assorted property rights. However, the state is not justified in forced takings of holdings (that is, via taxation) in order to serve the welfare needs of the poor.

In fact, Nozick is both supported (most notably by Edward Feser (2000)) and criticized (most notably by Brian Barry (1975, 332)) for comparing taxation with forced labor. “Taxation of earnings from labor,” argues Nozick, “is on a par with forced labor” (1974, 169).” He adds that “Seizing the results from someone’s labor is equivalent to seizing hours from him and directing him to carry on various activities. If people force you to do certain work, or unrewarded work, for a certain period of time, they decide what you are to do and what purposes your work is to serve apart from your decisions. This process whereby they take this decision from you makes them a part-owner of you; it gives them a property right in you. Just as having such partial control and power of decision, by right, over an animal or inanimate object would be to have a property right in it” (1974, 172).

3. Anarchy, State and Utopia

a. An Invisible Hand Justification of the State

In Anarchy, State and Utopia, Nozick first accepted the task of evaluating of whether government is necessary at all. Notice that Nozick is not merely addressing Rawls in writing Anarchy, State and Utopia. Part of the reason that Nozick became a libertarian was as a result of his discussion while a graduate student with Murray Rothbard. Rothbard not only convinced him of the plausibility of libertarianism, but also of the strength of challenges from anarchists to the idea that any state could be legitimate. Thus, Nozick took anarchist doubts about the legitimacy of the state seriously and thought these concerns needed to be addressed. Additionally, since Nozick commenced with the assertion that individuals have rights, he needed to see if the very notion of a state is compatible with these rights. It is important to note that Nozick believed in Lockean natural rights, and thus he had to show that a legitimate state could arise without the violation of them. What some commentators on Nozick disagree about is why Nozick did not use a social contract type argument (that is, in the tradition of Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau) for how a legitimate state could arise.

Some commentators (most forcefully Ralf Bader) do not believe Nozick avoided using a social contract approach to showing how a state could arise because he somehow worried that such an approach is problematic. On this interpretation, Nozick’s goal was not to show how an actual state came about, but that he simply wanted to give a plausible explanatory account of how a legitimate state could come to be (Bader, 2010, 29-30).  Bader notes that Nozick gives what he calls a fundamental potential explanation. A fundamental potential explanation is, as Nozick put it, “an explanation that would explain the whole realm under consideration were it the actual explanation” (Nozick, 1974, 8). But it would also do so with appealing to the realm itself. What this means is that Nozick tried to give an explanation of the political realm in non-political terms. He went to say that an adequate theory of the state of nature would describe “how a state arises from that state of nature will serve our explanatory purposes, even if no actual state arose in that way” (Nozick, 1974, 7). Since Nozick had this explanatory goal, this is part of the reason why he didn’t use a consent-based approach to showing the formation of the state. Using the consent approach, on this interpretation, would be a trivial case because it doesn’t explain the justification of the state in non-political terms and thus would not qualify as a fundamental potential explanation. Nozick didn’t want to simply show that people could agree to form a state, he wanted to reveal that even without their intention, the actions of people would lead to the establishment of a state.

However, other commentators on Nozick’s work (such as Jeffrey Paul) contend that as a natural rights libertarian, Nozick also knew that any argument he made for the justification of the state could not proceed from the approach that there is a social contract to which individuals would need to consent. There are two reasons for this. First of all, the state created via the social contract monopolizes protective services and thus constrains the property rights of those of succeeding generations who were not involved with the negotiations of the original contract. Secondly, in the social contract approach, the state would transfer the power to tax to the majority, which would bind subsequent generations to that power, and thereby would seem to violate Lockean property rights. On this interpretation, while Nozick still desired to give a fundamental potential explanation, he did so because it fits well in addressing anarchist complaints. For all of these substantive reasons, Paul believes that Nozick needed to take an approach that does not follow from social contract theory (J. Paul, 1981, 68).

No matter which interpretation is endorsed, most agree that in effect Nozick proposed a new solution to the very old problem of political legitimacy. His starting point was still a state of nature (just as it was for Locke, Hobbes and Rousseau), understood as the condition people find themselves in when no political authority exists. Nozick began with the question of whether there are any methods of efficient administration of justice within the state of nature. One of his original contributions to the debate over this question was to offer an account of how such a method could arise. In fact, Nozick thought that the method will inevitably result in the creation of a state despite the fact that no one intends to create one. This is known as an invisible hand justification of the state. Nozick proposed that individuals, simply via their pursuit of improving their own conditions will perform actions that will lead to a minimal state. Again, this result comes without anyone intending to found (or perhaps even conceive of) one. Additionally, and perhaps more importantly, Nozick argued that such a conclusion could be reached without violation of anyone’s property rights.

How did Nozick think he answered the anarchists who insist that no state could be legitimate because such an entity inherently violates individual rights? First, we have to more fully understand how he envisioned the anarchists’ main objection to the justifiable formation of a state. The anarchist objection as Nozick saw it involves the idea that the state by its nature monopolizes coercive power and then proceeds to punish those who violate this monopoly. When this notion is combined with the idea that states provide protection for all within a specific geographical area by coercing some to finance the protection of others, there is a violation of “side constraints” that come in the form of natural rights. Therefore, since these actions are performed by the state, and these actions are immoral, the state is immoral. Of course, anarchists think the criticism goes even deeper than this. They complain that these actions flow from what they see as the main, inherent function of the state, not merely as the result of any particular state that happens to violate the rights of individuals.

How exactly did Nozick think the state arises through his invisible hand approach? We have to imagine that we are in a free market state of nature, where individuals possess natural rights. Generally speaking, these individuals are moral actors. However, if some do not act morally (as some likely won’t on some occasions) we would enter into what Nozick called mutual protection agencies. These agencies sell security packages like a free market economic good that individuals in a state of nature would surely buy for self and property protection.

Mutual protection agencies will eventually develop into dominant protection agencies, which are basically the pre-eminent mutual protection agencies within their respective territories. In turn, dominant protection agencies will ultimately become ultra minimal states. An ultra minimal state is a dominant protection agency where protection is still purchased as an economic good but where the agency also has a monopoly on force in the region. The ultra minimal state will evolve into the minimal state, when in addition to having the two factors of the ultra minimal state also makes a “redistribution” of protection to some independents (non-clients of the ultra minimal state) within its territorial boundaries at the cost of the ultra minimal state’s clients.

Nozick regarded this evolution of protection agencies into states as significant because it would provide a moral justification for state legitimacy. First, he believed he had given an account of the legitimacy for the state using only an invisible hand explanation. Notice that for each step, individuals are voluntarily consenting to arrangements that are not necessarily designed to develop a state. Alternatively, private protection agencies are simply negotiating arrangements between its clients and independents in order to keep the peace. Second, Nozick thought this explanation qualifies as a fundamental potential explanation. That is, the invisible hand explanation explains the formation of the state in a nonpolitical way. In sum, Nozick proposed that the state is justified if it can be explained with a fundamental potential explanation that makes use of an invisible hand explanation without making any morally impermissible steps.

To show how this argument is supposed to run, we need to reflect on the right to self-defense, which in Nozick’s view is presumably a natural right that all have. More specifically, however, everyone has a right to resist if others try to enforce upon them unreliable or unfair procedures of justice. Individuals can elect to transfer this right to the dominant protection agency given that they have purchased the proper protection policy. On these grounds the dominant protection agency thereby can acquire the right to intervene and prohibit independents from trying to exact punishment on their clients. So, in cases where individuals consent to transfer these rights to their dominant protection agency, the dominant protection agency has this right and legitimately monopolizes force. At this point the dominant protection agency in effect becomes an ultra minimal state.

It is significant to notice that Nozick believed that clients of dominant protection agencies presumably do not have to show actual violations of their rights by independents to justify punishment of independents who try to enforce unreliable procedures of justice. In turn, he thought that the dominant protection agency, working on behalf of its clients, could legitimately prohibit independents who use unreliable procedures of justice. This is because when independents try to use unreliable procedures of justice they are effectively risking rights violations. In other words, this riskiness alone is all the justification the dominant protection agency needs in order to prevent independents from punishing their clients.

However, Nozick did realize that this transition from the dominant protection agency to the ultra minimal state places those independents in its territory at a disadvantage. In effect, independents are being prohibited from defending themselves or enforcing their right to punish wrongdoing. It seems that if one is disadvantaged by being prohibited from committing a risky action (that is, is kept from committing the potentially risky activity of applying a procedure of justice that is unreliable) he or she must be compensated for the said disadvantage. This compensation can come in the form of money or “in kind” services. In this case, Nozick thought it would be most feasible for the ultra minimal state to simply offer services instead of money to those disadvantaged by its monopoly of force. At this stage when the ultra minimal state provides protective services to the disadvantaged it thereby transforms into a minimal state.

In order to try to buttress his position for the legitimacy of the minimal state, Nozick provides a second strand of argument. He sets out to explain why, if the client of the ultra minimal state is actually guilty of violating the rights of an independent, the independent still doesn’t have a legitimate case for exacting punishment on the client of the ultra minimal state. After all, everyone else appears to have the right to punish wrongdoers when actual rights violations occur, so why shouldn’t the independent also have this right? In essence, Nozick had to try to justify the dominant protection agency’s prohibition of victims of rights violations by their clients from defending themselves and using their rights of punishment.

Again recall that Nozick thought no one has the right to use an unreliable procedure (or at least one of unproven reliability) to determine whether or not to punish anyone. He contended that it doesn’t matter whether we say a person does not have a right to do something in the absence of appropriate knowledge of wrongdoing or that she has the right but does wrong by using it in the absence of such knowledge. As it turns out, Nozick opts to use the latter expression which allows him to put forth what he calls the Epistemic Principle of Border Crossing. Nozick described this principle as the idea that if someone knows that doing act A would violate Q’s rights unless condition C obtained, he may not do A if he has not ascertained that C obtains through being in the best feasible position for ascertaining this.

Nozick believed that anyone may punish those who violate this principle, just so long as she does not violate the principle herself in the process. With this said, the independent who is being prohibited from exercising punishment ought to be prohibited because she is about to use a procedure that has not been proven reliable. That is, condition C has not been fulfilled and by attempting to exact punishment would be in violation of the Epistemic Principle of Border Crossing. So, in this way, the dominant protection agency is justified in opposing the action of the independent or in punishing the independent if she does carry on punishing its (admittedly guilty) client. Also notice that Nozick tries to deflect the charge from anarchists that granting independents protection regardless of the ability to pay is a form of redistribution of resources and hence a rights violation. Nozick is careful to point out that this action is a form of compensation to independents for effectively disallowing them the right to punish.

b. Individual Rights and the Nature of the Minimal State

As noted earlier, Nozick begins Anarchy, State and Utopia with the assertion that “individuals have rights.” He never defended this proposition, but its intuitive appeal is supposed to be widely shared. Nozick even admitted that he didn’t have a bedrock foundation for individual rights. Once more, he surveyed a number of candidate reasons for why individuals possess rights and found them, taken individually anyhow, to be wanting. He noted that moral agency, free will, and rationality in themselves are not sufficient to ground rights and serve as the moral foundation for his theory. For instance, he explained that the possession of free will, by itself, doesn’t imply that a being ought to act freely.

While Nozick had no structured argument for the notion that individuals possess rights, he did still think that there are reasons in favor of it. He concluded that some combination of the characteristics above constitute something closer to a moral ground for rights. He attempted to ground the intuition that individuals have rights in the idea that each individual has unique value. Only humans have the rational capacity to choose, devise, and pursue projects unlike non-human animals and commodities.

It bears mentioning that what it means to respect people as equals for Nozick draws on the work of Immanuel Kant. Kant thought that we show proper respect for persons when we treat them as ends in themselves. That is, we should treat others as having goals and projects of their own and we mustn’t use them merely as instruments to get what we want. Humans can deliberate about which behaviors will allow them to reach their goals and can only be used in a way that respects that rational capacity. This also means that people cannot be used in any way without their consent.

The individual rights that people possess amount to moral side constraints on what can be done to them. The only condition that could allow for the violations of such side constraints would be if this were the only way to “avoid catastrophic moral horror.” Barring such a dramatic condition, this means that the rights of individuals are not to be ‘traded in’ even if this means gains for the entire society. But why it is so important that individual rights to self and property are not violated could be further explained by the idea that individuals need the space to make their lives meaningful: “I [Nozick] conjecture that the answer [to the question as to what grounds rights] is connected with that elusive and difficult notion: the meaning of life.” Nozick went on to say that the ability of one to shape his life in accordance with some sort of life plan is the very way one brings meaning to his life. This offers another perspective from which we can understand why human life is uniquely valuable. Only beings with the rational capacity to shape their own lives can have or even pursue a meaningful life.

c. Self-Ownership Argument

Nozick attempted to demonstrate the intuition that only free market exchanges respect persons as equals. To do this Nozick developed his “entitlement theory of justice.” To make this clear, we have to start with what might be called his self-ownership argument. Nozick’s self-ownership argument essentially goes like this. 1) People own themselves. This is based on the intuition Nozick supplies above. 2) The world and its objects are originally unowned. 3) One can acquire an absolute right to a disproportionate share of the world if this doesn’t worsen the material condition of others. Furthermore, since Nozick thought each owns herself, each will also own her talents. He reasoned that this also translates into ownership of the products of those talents. The entity that owns and is owned is the same entity, the whole person. With this stipulation, Nozick understood individuals as having absolute property rights over themselves, and once more, absolute property rights over the resources they acquire. 4) It is relatively easy to acquire property rights over a disproportionate amount of the world. 5) Therefore, once private property has been appropriated, a free market in goods and resources is morally required.

d. Separateness of Persons

An important related strand that runs in various ways throughout all of Anarchy, State and Utopia is the “separateness of persons.” As noted earlier, Nozick used Kant as an inspiration and borrowed Kant’s idea that individuals are ends in themselves. But, in order to be different “ends-in-themselves,” Kant observed that people must be separate entities. The idea is the each of us is a distinct individual, each mattering from a moral point of view. This view that individuals, like distinct atoms, are self-contained entities in some ways evokes Hobbes’ metaphysical picture of human existence. An implication of the notion that individuals matter morally is that benefits to some supposed larger entity, such as the “greater society,” cannot be used as a justification for violating individuals as persons. Consider what is often called “the common good.” Nozick challenged the idea that any such entity could really exist. In his view, there are merely individuals, and the common good can only really be the good of these individuals added together. While it is true that some individuals might make sacrifices of some of their interests in order to gain benefits for some other of their interests, society can never be justified in sacrificing the interests of some individuals for the sake of others.

The separateness of persons doctrine is important to Nozick insofar as he thought it supports the existence of moral side-constraints that individuals possess. Moral side constraints set the boundaries for what can permissibly be done to people (whether by other individuals or the state). Violations of such side constraints are wrongful because this treats individuals who suffer the violations merely as means or as instruments to the ends of other people. Notice that these side constraints are supposed to be understood as absolute prohibitions on what can permissibly be done to individuals. That is, even if we thought that violation of the moral side-constraint of just one person could be to the benefit of many others within the society, such a violation could not be justified.

In trying to describe what exactly moral side constraints are perhaps the most obvious prohibition that would follow from them would be any sort of physical aggression. But the very existence of a state seems to suggest coercion of individuals is permissible in some circumstances. As a consequence, Nozick needed to carefully argue that at least one possible function of the state, redistributive taxation, is a form of coercion that is not legitimate for a state to exercise.

e. The Three Principles of Justice

Nozick argued that there are three principles of just distribution. These principles make up the basic framework of his entitlement theory.

The first is the principle of just acquisition. Under this principle, individuals may acquire any property they wish just so long as it is previously unowned and is not taken by theft, coercion or fraud. The second is the principle of just transfer whereby property may be exchanged just so long as the transfer is not executed (again) by theft, force or fraud. These two principles constitute the legitimate means of acquiring and transferring goods. All valid transactions come from repeated actions on these two principles. While Nozick did not explicitly define what is now known as his third principle, he described its function. This third principle – just rectification – works, as the name suggests, to rectify violations of the first two principles.

What actions on these three principles reflect is what Nozick calls a “historical” theory of justice. He thought there was no way, simply by looking at the patterns of distribution that we could tell whether or not these distributions of goods are just. Nozick emphasized that we have to know exactly how the distribution came about. If somewhere in the chain of transactions theft, coercion or fraud occurred, then we could safely say that the property involved is unjustly held. The three principles of just distribution thereby regulate proper property acquisition and exchange.

As alluded to earlier, the entitlement theory of justice does not depend on the concept of just desert (reward) in order to validate the acquisition or transfer of property. For example, consider the principle of just transfer. One implication of this principle is that inheritance is perfectly legitimate. It is irrelevant from the perspective of the entitlement theory that the scions of billionaires may not have worked hard or contributed in any way to their parents’ fortunes. Moreover, it is not germane to the entitlement theorist that the benefactor of the inheritance is morally upstanding or somehow has made great contributions to society. Finally, it doesn’t matter that the scion’s being a part of billionaire family is morally arbitrary – that there is no sense of thinking that he is somehow undeserving of inheritance because he didn’t “make his way” into the family . If the billionaire wishes to gift the family fortune to the ne’er-do-well son, the son is entitled to that inheritance. The idea that just holdings for Nozick are not dependent on desert is an important consideration given that many free market advocates have tried to justify accumulation of enormous amounts of wealth based on the desert of those acquiring it. Common notions of desert appeal to the concepts of effort, innovation, contribution or merit in attempting to justify why some should have more than others. But Nozick saw the strained arguments used for the justification of property holdings on the basis of desert. For Nozick, desert is beside the point. But more importantly, desert theory cannot be justified as the basis for the justification of property holdings on his view because it is a patterned theory (more on this below).

The state then can be seen as an institution that serves to protect private property rights and the transactions that follow from them regardless of our thoughts of some people deserving more or less than they have. This function is fulfilled via preservation of the three principles of distribution. This means that the state functions to secure individuals’ safety and their goods, which presumably could be threatened by forces within or from outside of one’s territory. For security within the state, this necessitates a civil police force. For security from threats outside of the territory, the need is for a standing army. Provisions for these functions are legitimate concerns of the Nozickian state. In addition, given the third principle of distributive justice in Nozick’s scheme, there will need to be a judiciary. This is due to the practical matter that there will likely be disagreements over the status of contracts, whether they have been enacted properly, and whether allegations of personal or property rights violations have occurred. Somebody needs to adjudicate these conflicts, and the most effective means (according to Nozick) is through tort law proceedings. Also, the courts are to function in perhaps a more obvious way given the principle of rectification – to ensure that holdings are restored to their rightful owners in cases where justice in acquisition and justice in transfer principles are violated. An implication of all of this is that the state is within its right to demand tax monies to support these functions.

f. The Wilt Chamberlain and "Sunset/Yacht Lover" Examples

Nozick devises an imaginative example using an actual former professional basketball player (Wilt Chamberlain) to criticize what he calls “patterned” theories of justice. Patterned theories of justice are those whereby the distribution of holdings is considered to be just when there is some purpose or goal reached. For example, radical egalitarians argue that the most just distribution of goods and resources is one in which these items are equally shared across a society. Utilitarianism is another example of a patterned theory since all goods are justly distributed when they maximize the overall good of a society. Finally, John Rawls’ theory of justice would be considered to be a patterned theory because goods may only be distributed in the case that transfers benefit the least well-off members of society. What all of these theories share is that distributions of goods will only be declared just when they conform to a pattern stipulated by a favored principle of justice.

To argue against patterned theories of just distribution, Nozick wanted to show that patterns can only be imposed by either disallowing acts that disrupt the pattern (or as Nozick puts it, to “forbid capitalist acts between two adults”) or to constantly redistribute goods in order to reset the pattern. Nozick tried to demonstrate the truth of two propositions. The first is that if individuals have acquired their holdings justly, then the free exchange of them with others (provided no theft, fraud or coercion are involved) are just. The second proposition is supposed to result from the first. It holds that free exchanges will always conclude in disrupting alleged patterns of just distribution. But it seems that if we have ownership of property legitimately, we can dispose of it in any way we wish no matter what distribution of goods results. Nozick certainly realized that allowing individuals to exchange their goods without any patterning principle would lead to extreme inequalities of resources. However, he thought any measures to “correct” for such inequalities by governmental intervention would be unjust.

In the Wilt Chamberlain example, Nozick has us imagine a society that has the reader’s favorite distribution of resources. For the sake of argument, we’ll say that there are one million and one members and all have equal shares – we’ll call this distribution D1. We are also to imagine that Wilt signs a contract with a team with the stipulation that for each home game he gets 25 cents from the price of every ticket sold. As the season goes on, imagine that each person in the society gladly contributes 25 cents to see Wilt perform. After a million fans come to see him play, he has made $250,000. Therefore, there will be a new distribution, D2, in which Wilt has his original resources plus $250,000. Excluding all other transactions, we can assume that all others in society have much less than Wilt. Nozick asks if there is anything unjust about this example and if there is anything unjust, what could be the reason? Since each person agreed to D1, each person should be entitled to his or her share. This also means that each individual may choose to do with his resources what he likes and many have decided to give some to Wilt. Obviously D1 and D2 are not the same. However, D2 came from what we agreed was a just distribution plus a number of free exchanges. So, D2 is just, but D2 violates the pattern in D1 in which each is supposed to remain on the same level of resources.

Nozick’s first point is that allowing individuals the liberty to exchange their goods as they wish, given that they have fully consented to the transfers will clearly (and continually) disrupt the pattern of holdings. Notice that if you agree with Nozick that no injustice is done in the steps of forming the new set of holdings in D2, there is nothing unjust about D2. But what if one wants to re-establish D1? Notice what Nozick thinks would have to happen in this case. In order to realign the pattern of holdings, some entity (most likely the state) would need to intervene. That is, if D1 was that all had equal holdings and now at D2 we realize we want to revert to D1, we would have to take a portion of the holdings from those who have more to give to those who have less. But, here is the problem: What if those who have greater holdings in D2 do not want to give up their holdings, protesting that they had acquired them justly? If the state takes a portion of holdings away, how is this different from Robin Hood doing the same thing? Isn’t this merely a form of theft?

With the Wilt Chamberlain example in place, this provided Nozick with the opportunity to bolster his argument against patterned theories. He emphasized the point that preserving patterns will often necessitate redistributing goods through taxation from those who have to those who have not and that this is not an innocuous result. In effect, this redistribution results in forced labor. After all, Nozick pointed out, what do taxes represent? Certainly, money is taken, but Nozick argued that “seizing the results of someone’s labor is equivalent to seizing hours from him and directing him to carry on various activities.” In essence, Nozick thought that this is tantamount to forcing someone to work for an amount of time for proposes he has not chosen. Patterned principles in effect give some people a claim to the labor of other people. Nozick believed this translates into a transgression of self-ownership as the enforceable claim of some on the labor of others amounts to the partial ownership of some people by others.

There is another problem here as well. Nozick also worried that the degree of interference in peoples’ lives will vary depending on their different chosen lifestyles in a way that is discriminatory against certain people. He wondered why people shouldn’t have the right to choose their own lifestyles provided that they are not making others worse off than they would have been in a state of nature? Nozick objected that individuals who have more materialistic interests are required to work longer hours than those with more aesthetic lifestyles. He questioned why the person who wishes to “see a movie” must be required (since he must earn money for the movie ticket) to provide “money for the needy” while those who prefer to look at sunsets (who don’t need to earn money to enjoy them) do not? The point Nozick was trying to make is that if owning a luxury yacht is what makes me happy, I will have to work much longer than someone who simply likes sunsets. The person who likes sunsets doesn’t need money to enjoy them – he can pursue his happiness and meet his tax obligations to the state with limited labor time. However, I may need to work six extra months to have enough to purchase the yacht and meet my tax obligations to the state. Not only do I need the principle amount of money for the purchase, I am also taxed to provide for social programs. In this scenario, Nozick wonders why the yacht lover, simply because of his lifestyle, has to work six months to acquire what he wants and pay his taxes, as opposed to the sunset lover, who needs to work much less to achieve these same ends.

g. The Experience Machine

While the Wilt Chamberlain and sunset/yacht lover examples may take aim at any sort of patterned theory (though it was most likely targeted at Rawls’ theory of justice), Nozick uses yet another creative example to argue against classical utilitarianism. He has us imagine a machine developed by “super duper neuropsychologists” into which one could enter and have any sort of experience she desires. A person’s brain could be stimulated so she would think and feel that she was reading a book, writing a great novel, or climbing Mt.Everest. But all of the time the person would simply be floating in a tank with electrodes attached to her head. If one worries that she would get bored by a life of pleasant circumstances, there is nothing that disallows her from simply having problematic events programmed in to keep things interesting. As this is a thought experiment, and Nozick doesn’t want readers to be distracted by details that don’t force them to test their intuitions, we are to imagine that the machine is reliable, in fact unbreakable, so these would not be technical or trivial reasons to fail to enter. Nozick asks the reader if she would enter the machine.

Nozick thought we would not enter, concluding that people would follow his intuition that such programmed experiences are not real. He argued that people don’t merely want to experience certain actions, but that they want to actually do them. Nozick suspects that we wouldn’t enter the machine because we don’t merely wish to experience being famous, but we want to be certain types of people who do certain types of thing. For example, I don’t merely want to experience that I am a great novelist, I want to genuinely be a great novelist.

In what way is the intuition we are supposed to gain from the experience machine a criticism of classical utilitarianism? The idea is the fundamental value underlying utilitarianism as classically described by Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill is that happiness is the highest and only intrinsic good. That is, happiness is the good for whose sake all other goods are pursued. Presumably the initial allure of entering into Nozick’s machine would be the promise of acquiring pleasure. However, the unwillingness to ultimately enter seems to signify that we want something else beyond happiness in our lives, whether that is reality or genuineness. Hence, it appears that happiness is not the highest good. Though this appears to strike a significant blow against classical utilitarianism, it doesn’t seem to affect other forms of utilitarianism such as preference utilitarianism. Preference utilitarians could claim that people might not go into the machine not because they care about values other than happiness more, but because they prefer to experience happiness only via some means that involve actively pursuing happiness and not merely experiencing it. Furthermore, they might see happiness in a complex way whereby they don’t merely desire “brute” pleasure, but want a nuanced sort of happiness.

h. The Lockean Proviso

Are there any limits to how many more resources some may own over others assuming that the distribution of holdings came about in a just way, even on Nozick’s view? There is one (albeit loose) constraint – the Lockean Proviso. While Nozick did not accept the entire Lockean theory of property, he does utilize components of it and retrofits them for his own use in his theory of entitlement. One of the famous constraints on property accumulation from Locke; is that one may own property just so long as he has left “enough and as good” for others. This prevents the monopolization of goods that are necessary for life. For instance, owning the only remaining water well would not be permitted under the terms of the proviso.

However, Nozick re-interprets the proviso to mean that if the initial acquisition fails to make anyone worse off who was using the resource before, then it is justly acquired. That is, in Nozick’s interpretation of the proviso, the position of others after the acquisition cannot be made worse off than they were when the property in question was unowned. Of course, this rendering of the proviso means that someone could appropriate all of a good, just so long as they allowed access to it to those who were using the resource before and that this appropriation does not make them worse off materially than they were before. This alternative rendering of the Lockean proviso leaves only an extremely limited constraint on the accumulation of resources. Hence, it would seem that even with the amended Lockean proviso adding some qualification to the acquisition of resources, Nozick’s entitlement theory would still allow for rather dramatic inequality of holdings throughout a libertarian society.

i. Utopia

The third and final part of Anarchy, State and Utopia deals with the topic of utopia and is generally thought to be the section of the book that receives the least amount of attention. Many scholars have noted that this section seems to serve as Nozick’s attempt to make what seems to be a very bleak picture of property rights (in which the poor are left being aided only by the discretion of private benefactors) into a potentially inspiring political model. But a second purpose of this section is likely to provide an independent argument for the minimal state.

Nozick begins the section by noting that we could use two different methods for figuring out what is the best sort of society to live in. One method he calls a “design” method and the other he dubs a “filter” method. By a design method Nozick had in mind the idea of people brainstorming about what the best sort of society might be (for example, Rawls’ method in A Theory of Justice). Then, the group could pattern a single society based on the desiderata arising from these deliberations. However, Nozick was skeptical about the viability of this model to yield successful results. He didn’t think that it is possible for there to be just one best form of society for everyone. Human beings are complex, with lots of different ideas about what traits would adhere to the best possible world. To make this point, Nozick has us imagine a bevy of different historical figures (including Beethoven, Wittgenstein, Henry Ford, Thoreau, Elizabeth Taylor, and Moses). Nozick challenges us to consider whether there could really be any one ideal world for all of these very different individuals. In the least, Nozick says that it is highly unlikely that even if there were one ideal society for all, that it could be determined in “an a priori fashion.”

Instead, he turns to the possibility of using a filtering device and promotes the idea of a sort of meta-utopia. In this filtering method, people consider many different societies and critique them, eliminating some and modifying others. In this process, we can imagine people trying out societies as a sort of experiment, leaving those they find hopeless or altering those they could find acceptable with some tinkering. As we might expect, some communities will simply be abandoned, others will flourish, and some will continue on but not without struggles. So, this meta-utopia would serve as a framework or platform for many diverse experimental communities. These would all be formed as voluntary communities, whereby no one would have the right to impose one utopian vision on the others. This effectively disallows “imperialistic” communities that may take as their mission to gain control of other communities for its own expansion. Some commentators have likened this anti-imperialistic clause in Nozick’s framework of utopia to a version of cultural relativism.

The point of Nozick’s framework for utopia is that consenting citizens could band together into political subunits and voluntarily select from any number of different societies to join. For example, those sympathetic with trade unionists could elect to develop a community where ownership groups consisted only of workers. In fact, Nozick was surprised that this sort of arrangement had not already evolved from vocal members of the political left who argue that the only just notion of property is one held by all in a classless society. A different subgroup which collectively decides that a strong welfare safety net is essential could vote to tax themselves at a high level in order to redistribute goods to help out the least fortunate via extensive rights to health care, child care, unemployment assistance, and so forth.

Nozick thought that following his political principles could lead to a vast array of different political entrepreneurships. All that is required is that one (or many) recruit fellow members to join into an association of likeminded citizens who all voluntarily agree to follow the stipulations of their new community. Notice that there is no violation of rights here. Just so long as all agree to the rules of the group, they could agree to form a society that looks much like the social democracies of Scandinavia. Likewise, it seems possible that individuals could join to form quite illiberal communities. The minimal requirements involve the idea that no one can be forced or deceived into joining. Additionally, if one is disenchanted with his/her current political association, he or she must have a right to exit.

Some commentators have thought that for the sake of clarity, it would be best to think of Nozick’s utopian vision here in a federalist fashion. The minimal state would serve as a replacement for the federal government. Smaller political entities, such as states or provinces could be developed which would consist of groups of citizens who voluntarily (but unanimously) agree to their own separate sets of political ideals. Additionally, reflecting on the best method for allowing individuals to achieve their own utopian aspirations leads us to a separate argument for the minimal state. For if we agree with Nozick that the filtering method is the best way for individuals to realize their utopian dreams, they should endorse his conception of a minimal state. After all, what is the framework for utopia but a minimal state? Notice that in the final section of Anarchy State and Utopia, the minimal state is not justified on the grounds of individual rights. Instead, the minimal state here provides a political framework that respects diversity and allows different individuals to pursue their own conceptions of the good. Nozick thinks that this should be considered as a major advantage to endorsing libertarian principles as a platform or framework for political organization.

4. Later Thought on Libertarianism

Famously, Nozick largely abandons work in political philosophy after the publication of Anarchy, State and Utopia. He mentions in Socratic Puzzles that he had no interest in defending his libertarian views in political theory from its critics by writing “Son of Anarchy, State and Utopia” or “Return of the Son of Anarchy.” However, in The Examined Life, Nozick did indicate that he had strayed away from libertarianism. On the other hand, the details for this turn are thin and somewhat mysterious. Nozick said that he did not mean to work out his own alternative to libertarianism later in life and only points out what he viewed as a major failure of the theory

He notes that libertarianism is seriously inadequate, partially because the theory does not “fully knit the humane considerations and joint cooperative activities it left room for more closely into its fabric” (that is, a communitarian or Aristotelian analysis). Apparently he also thought that somehow the theory did not take into account sufficiently the “symbolic” importance of some collective actions. He acknowledges that there are some goals citizens wish to achieve through the means of government as an expression of our human solidarity and perhaps of human respect in itself. Some commentators have noted that we shouldn’t interpret these reservations as a wholesale abdication of libertarianism. In an interview late in his life Nozick explained that his turn away from libertarianism was largely exaggerated, adding that he still endorsed the theory but was no longer a “hard core” follower.

5. References and Future Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Nozick, Robert. Anarchy, State and Utopia. New York: Basic Books, 1974.
  • Nozick, Philosophical Explanations. Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1981.
  • Nozick, Robert. Socratic Puzzles. Cambridge, MA: HarvardUniversity Press, 1997.
  • Nozick, Robert. The Examined Life. New York: Simon and Schuster, 1989.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Althan, J.E.J. Review of Anarchy, State and Utopia. Philosophy. Vol. 52, no. 199 (1977), pp. 102-105.
  • Bader, Ralf. Robert Nozick. London, Continuum Press, 2010.
  • Bakaya, Santosh. The Political Theory of Robert Nozick. Delhi, India: Gyan Books, 2006.
  • Barry, Brian. Review of Anarchy, State and Utopia by Robert Nozick. Political Theory, Vol. 3, No. 3 (1975), pp. 331-336.
  • Brighouse, Harry. Justice. Cambridge, U.K.: Polity Press, 2004.
  • Cohen, G.A. Self-Ownership, Freedom, and Equality. (Cambridge, U.K.: CambridgeUniversity Press, 1995.
  • Exdell, John. Distributive Justice: Nozick on Property Rights. Ethics, Vol. 87, No. 2 (1977), pp. 142-149.
  • Feser, Edward. Taxation, Forced Labor, and Theft. The Independent Review, Vol. 2, No. 2 (2000), pp. 219-235.
  • Fried, Barbara. Wilt Chamberlain Revisited: Nozick’s ‘Justice in Transfer’ and the Problem of Market-Based Distribution. Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 24, No. 3 (1995), pp. 226-245.
  • Hailwood, Simon A. Exploring Nozick. Aldershot, UK: Avebury, 1996.
  • Holmes, Robert. Nozick on Anarchism. Political Theory, Vol. 5, No.2 (1977), pp. 247-256.
  • Lacey, A.R. Robert Nozick. Princeton, NJ: PrincetonUniversity Press, 2001.
  • Litan, Robert. On Rectification in Nozick’s Minimal State. Political Theory, Vol. 5, no. 2 (1977), pp. 233-246.
  • Kearl, J.R. Do Entitlements Imply that Taxation is Theft? Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 7, no. 1 (1977), pp. 74-81.
  • Kymlicka, Will. Contemporary Political Philosophy. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1990.
  • Machan, Tibor. Some Recent Work in Human Rights Theory. American Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 17, No. 2 (1980), pp. 103-115.
  • Murray, Dale. Nozick, Autonomy and Compensation. London: Continuum Press, 2007.
  • Otsuka, Michael. Self-Ownership and Equality: A Lockean Reconciliation. Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 27, no.1 (1998), pp. 65-92.
  • Paul, Ellen Frankel. Natural Rights Liberalism from Locke to Nozick. Cambridge, UK: CambridgeUniversity Press, 2005.
  • Paul, Jeffrey. Reading Nozick. Totawa, NJ: Rowman & Littlefield, 1981.
  • Rigterink, Roger. Robert Nozick: Anarchy, State and Utopia. (Unpublished essay, 2007).
  • Sandel, Michael. Liberalism and its Critics. New York: New YorkUniversity Press, 1984.
  • Scanlon, Thomas. Nozick on Rights, Liberty, and Property. Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 6, No. 1 (1976), pp. 3-25.
  • Schmidtz, David. Robert Nozick. Cambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 2002.
  • Sterba, James. Recent Work on Alternative Conceptions of Justice. American Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 23, No. 1 (1986), pp. 1-22.
  • Wolff, Jonathan. Robert Nozick: Property, Justice, and the Minimal State. Stanford, CA: StanfordUniversity Press, 1991.

Author Information

Dale Murray
Email: dale.murray@uwc.edu
University of Wisconsin-Baraboo/Sauk County
University of Wisconsin-Richland
U. S. A.

What Science Requires of Time

What Science Requires of Time

Table of Contents

  1. Relativity and Quantum Mechanics
  2. The Big Bang
  3. Infinite Time
  4. Continuity of Time

Relativity and Quantum Mechanics

EinsteinScience currently requires all the basic laws of science to be time symmetric, to not distinguish between change toward the future and change toward the past. [The second law of thermodynamics is not a basic law.] Also, the basic laws cannot change from one day to another. The basic laws are the laws at the foundation of our two most fundamental physical theories, general relativity and quantum mechanics. The Big Bang theory is the leading theory of cosmology, and it, too, has consequences for our understanding of time, as we shall see.

According to relativity and quantum mechanics, spacetime is, loosely speaking, a collection of points called “spacetime locations” where the universe’s physical events occur. Spacetime is four-dimensional and a continuum, and time is a distinguished, one-dimensional sub-space of this continuum. Therefore, it is less misleading to speak of 4-dimensional spacetime as (3 + 1)-dimensional spacetime.

Any interval of time–that is, any duration–is a linear continuum of instants. So, science requires every duration to have a point-like structure that is the same structure as an interval of real numbers. This implies that between any two instants there are an aleph-one infinity of other instants, and there are no gaps in the sequence of instants. Notice that time is not quantized even in quantum mechanics.

That first response to the question “What does science require of time?” is too simple. There are complications. There is an important difference between the universe’s cosmic time and any object's proper time; and there is an important difference between proper time and a reference frame’s coordinate time.  Unlike in special relativity, most spacetimes can not have a single coordinate system. Also, special relativity considers space-time to be a passive arena for events, but general relativity requires spacetime to be dynamic in the sense that changes in matter-energy can change the curvature of space-time itself. All physicists believe that relativity and quantum mechanics are logically inconsistent and need to be replaced by a theory of quantum gravity. A successful theory of quantum gravity is likely to have radical implications for our understanding of time; two prominent suggestions of what those implications might be are that time and space will be seen to be discrete rather than continuous, and time and space will be seen to emerge from more basic entities. But today "the best game in town" says time is not discrete and does not emerge from a more basic timeless entity.

Aristotle, Newton, and everyone else before Einstein, believed there is a frame-independent notion of duration. For example, if the time interval (duration) between two lightning flashes is 100 seconds on someone’s accurate clock, then it also is 100 seconds on your own accurate clock, even if you are flying at an incredible speed nearby or far away. Einstein rejected this piece of common sense in his 1905 special theory of relativity when he declared that the duration of a non-instantaneous event is relative to (that is, depends on) the observer’s reference frame. As Einstein expressed it, “Every reference-body has its own particular time; unless we are told the reference-body to which the statement of time refers, there is no meaning in a statement of the time of an event.” Two reference frames, or reference-bodies, that are moving relative to each other will divide spacetime differently into its time part and its space part, so they will disagree about the duration of an event that is not instantaneous. In short, your accurate clock need not agree with my accurate clock, and any two initially synchronized clocks will not stay synchronized if they are in motion relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces.

In 1908, the mathematician Hermann Minkowski had an original idea in metaphysics regarding space and time. He was the first person to realize that spacetime is more fundamental than either time or space alone. As he put it, “Henceforth space by itself, and time by itself, are doomed to fade away into mere shadows, and only a kind of union of the two will preserve an independent reality.” The metaphysical assumption behind Minkowski’s remark is that what is “independently real” is what does not vary from one reference frame to another. What does not vary is their union, what we now call “spacetime.” It seems to follow that the division of events into the past ones, the present ones, and the future ones is also not “independently real.” One philosophical implication that Minkowski and Einstein accepted is that it’s an error to say, “Only my present is real.”

A coordinate system or reference frame is a way of representing space and time using numbers to represent spacetime points. Science confidently assigns numbers to times because, in any reference frame, the happens-before order-relation on events is faithfully reflected in the less-than order-relation on the time numbers (dates) that we assign to events. In the fundamental theories such as relativity and quantum mechanics, the values of the time variable t in any reference frame are real numbers, not merely rational numbers. Each number designates an instant of time, and time is a linear continuum of these instants ordered by the happens-before relation, similar to the mathematician’s line segment that is ordered by the less-than relation. Therefore, if these fundamental theories are correct, then physical time is one-dimensional rather than two-dimensional, and continuous rather than discrete. These features do not require time to be linear, however, because a segment of a circle is also a linear continuum, but there is no evidence for circular time, that is, for causal loops. Causal loops are worldlines that are closed curves in spacetime.

In mathematical physics, the ordering of instants by the happens-before relation, that is, by temporal precedence, is complete in the sense that there are no gaps in the sequence of instants. Unlike physical objects, physical time is believed to be infinitely divisible--divisible in the sense of the actually infinite, not merely in Aristotle's sense of potentially infinite. Regarding the number of instants in any (non-zero) duration, time’s being a linear continuum implies the ordered instants are so densely packed that between any two there is a third, so that no instant has a next instant. In fact, time’s being a linear continuum implies that there is a nondenumerable infinity of instants between any two instants, that is, an aleph one number of instants. There is little doubt that the actual temporal structure of events can be embedded in the real numbers, but how about the converse? That is, to what extent is it known that the real numbers can be adequately embedded into the structure of the instants? The problem here is that, although time is not quantized in quantum theory, for times shorter than about 10-43 second (the so-called Planck time), science has no experimental grounds for the claim that between any two events there is a third. Instead, the justification of saying the reals can be embedded into an interval of instants is that the assumption of continuity is convenient and useful, and there are no known inconsistencies due to making this assumption, and that there are no better theories available.

Relativity theory challenges a great many of our intuitive beliefs about time. For events occurring at the same place, relativity theory implies the order is absolute (independent of the frame of reference) and so agrees with common sense, but for distant events occurring close enough in time to be in each other’s absolute elsewhere, event A can occur before event B in one reference frame, but after B in another frame, and simultaneously with B in yet another frame. For example, suppose you are sitting exactly in the middle of a moving train when lightning strikes simultaneously in the front and back of the train. You will know they were simultaneous if the light from the two strikes reaches you at the same time. But from the reference frame of a person standing still on the ground outside the train, the lightning strike at the back of the train happened first. From a frame fixed to a fast plane flying overhead in the same direction as the train and toward the front of the train, then the lightning strike at the front of the train really happened first. It was Einstein's original idea that all three judgments are correct. The event at the front of the train really did happen first, and it really did happen second, and it really did happen at the same time as the event at the back. It's all a matter of which reference frame is used to make the judgment. Philosophical realists infer from this that events in your absolute elsewhere are as real as any other events even though the only part of the universe that you can directly observe is your own past light cone, your backward cone.

Science impacts our understanding of time in other fundamental ways. Special relativity theory implies there is time dilation between one frame and another. For example, the faster a clock moves, the slower it runs, relative to stationary clocks. But this does not work just for clocks. If a human being moves fast, the human being also ages more slowly than someone who is stationary. Time dilation effects occur for tiny protons, too, but protons do not readily show the effects of their aging the way human bodies and clocks do.

Time dilation shows itself when a speeding twin returns to find that his (or her) Earth-bound twin has aged more rapidly. This surprising dilation result has caused some philosophers to question the consistency of relativity theory by arguing that, if motion is relative, then we could call the speeding twin “stationary” and it would follow that this twin is now the one who ages more rapidly. This argument is called the twin paradox. Experts now are agreed that the mistake is within the argument for the paradox, not within relativity theory. The twins feel different accelerations, so their two situations are not sufficiently similar to carry out the argument. The argument fails to notice the radically different relationships that each twin has to the rest of the universe as a whole. This is why one twin’s proper time is so different than the other’s.

[An object's proper time along its worldline, that is, along its path in 4-d spacetime, is the time elapsed by a clock having the same worldline. Coordinate time is the time measured by a clock at rest in the (inertial) frame. A clock isn't really measuring the time in a reference frame other than one fixed to the clock. In other words, a clock primarily measures the elapsed proper time between events that occur along its own worldline. Technically, a clock is a device that measures the spacetime interval along its own worldline. If the clock is at rest in an inertial frame, then it measures the "coordinate time." If the spacetime has no inertial frame then it can't have a normal coordinate time.]

There are two kinds of time dilation. Special relativity’s time dilation involves speed; general relativity’s also involves gravitational fields (and accelerations). Two ideally synchronized clocks need not stay in synchrony if they undergo different gravitational forces. This gravitational time dilation would be especially apparent if one of the two clocks were to approach a black hole. As a clock falls toward a black hole, time slows on approach to the event horizon, and it completely stops at the horizon (not just at the center of the hole)—relative to time on a clock that remains safely back on Earth.

If, as many physicists suspect, the microstructure of spacetime (near the Planck length which is much smaller than the diameter of a proton) is a quantum foam of changing curvature of spacetime with black holes forming and dissolving, then time loses its meaning at this small scale. The philosophical implication is that time exists only when we are speaking of regions large compared to the Planck length.

General Relativity theory may have even more profound implications for time. In 1948, the logician Kurt Gödel  discovered radical solutions to Einstein’s equations, solutions in which there are closed timelike curves due to the rotation of the universe’s matter, so that as one progresses forward in time along one of these curves one arrives back at one’s starting point. Gödel drew the conclusion that if matter is distributed so that there is Gödelian spacetime (that is, with a preponderance of galaxies rotating in one direction rather than another), then the universe has no linear time. There is no evidence that our universe has this rotation.

We’ve said little about quantum mechanics, but time reversibility is implied by quantum mechanics and not relativity theory. The process of falling into a black hole does not have an inverse process in relativity theory, but every quantum process has an inverse process, so the two major theories are inconsistent on this issue.

The Big Bang

The Big Bang is a violent explosion of spacetime that began billions of years ago. It is not an explosion within preexisting space; the explosion creates new space. The Big Bang theory in some form or other is accepted by the vast majority of astronomers, but it is not as firmly accepted as is the theory of relativity. Here is a quick story of its origin. In 1922, the Russian physicist Alexander Friedmann predicted from general relativity that the universe should be expanding. In 1925, the American astronomer Edwin Hubble made careful observations of clusters of galaxies and confirmed that they are undergoing a universal expansion, on average.

The Big Bang theory is a theory of how our universe evolved, how it expanded and cooled from this beginning. This beginning process is called the “Big Bang” and the expansion and cooling is continuing today. Atoms are not expanding; our solar system is not expanding; even the cluster of galaxies to which the Milky Way belongs is not expanding. But most every galaxy cluster is moving away from the others. It is as if the clusters are exploding away from each other, and in the future they will be very much farther away from each other. But the explosion is not occurring within space; the explosion is an explosion of space. Now, consider the past instead of the future. At any earlier moment the universe was more compact. Projecting to earlier and earlier times, and assuming that gravitation is the main force at work, the astronomers now conclude that 13.7 billion years ago (which happens to be three times the age of our planet) the universe was in a state of nearly zero size and infinite density. Because all substances cool when they expand, physicists believe the universe itself must have been cooling down over the last 13.7 billion years, and so it begin expanding when it was extremely hot. At present the average temperature of space in all very large regions has cooled to 2.7 Celsius degrees above absolute zero. Space is presently expanding at a rate of 71 kilometers per second per megaparsec, a rate that is increasing. A galaxy that is now 100 light years away from the Milky Way will, in another 13.7 billion years, be more than 200 light years away.

As far as we knew back in the 20th century, the entire universe was created in the Big Bang, and time itself came into existence “at that time.” So, the day of the Big Bang was a day without a yesterday. With the appearance of the new theories of quantum gravity in the 21st century, the question of what happened for the Big Bang has been resurrected as legitimate.

In the literature in both physics and philosophy, descriptions of the Big Bang often assume that a first event is also a first instant of time and that spacetime did not exist outside the Big Bang. This intimate linking of a first event with a first time is a philosophical move, not something demanded by the science. It is not even clear that it is correct to call the Big Bang an event. The Big Bang “event” is a singularity without space coordinates, but events normally must have space coordinates. One response to this problem is to alter the definition of “event” to allow the Big Bang to be an event. Another response, from James Hartle and Stephen Hawking, is to consider the past cosmic time-interval to be open rather than closed at t = 0. Looking back to the Big Bang is then like following the positive real numbers back to ever smaller positive numbers without ever reaching a smallest positive one. If Hartle and Hawking are correct that time is actually like this, then the universe had no beginning event.

Classical Big Bang theory is based on the assumption that the universal expansion of clusters of galaxies can be projected all the way back. Yet physicists agree that the projection must become untrustworthy in the Planck era, that is, for all times less than 10-43 second after the beginning of the Big Bang. Current science cannot speak with confidence about the nature of time within the Planck era. If a theory of quantum gravity does get confirmed, it should provide information about this Planck era, and it may even allow physicists to answer the question, “What caused the Big Bang?” and "Did anything happen before then?"

The scientifically radical, but theologically popular, answer, “God caused the Big Bang, but He, himself, does not exist in time” is a cryptic answer because it is not based on a well-justified and detailed theory of who God is, how He caused the Big Bang, and how He can exist but not be in time. It is also difficult to understand St. Augustine’s remark that “time itself was made by God.” On the other hand, for a person of faith, belief in their God is usually stronger than belief in any scientific hypothesis, or in any desire for a scientific justification of their remark about God, or in the importance of satisfying any philosopher’s demand for clarification.

Some physicists are advocating revision of the classical Big Bang theory in order to allow for the “cosmic landscape” or “multiverse,” in which there are multiple big bangs. See (Veneziano, 2006). But there is no external time in which these universes exist, which means that it is not sensible to speak of one universe occurring before or after any other within the multiverse. Also, in some of these universes there is no time dimension at all. However, this new theory is not generally accepted by theoretical cosmologists. Another cosmological theory is that the Big Bang represents a bounce from an earlier compression of the universe; there may be a sequence of bangs and crunches, and presently we are in a bang phase, that is, an expanding phase.

Infinite Time

clockThere are three ways to interpret the question of whether physical time is infinite: (a) Is time infinitely divisible? (b) Will there be an infinite amount of time in the future? (c) Was there an infinite amount of time in the past?

(a) Is time infinitely divisible? Yes, because general relativity and quantum mechanics require time to be a continuum. But the answer is no if these theories are eventually replaced by a relativistic quantum mechanics that quantizes time. “Although there have been suggestions that spacetime may have a discrete structure,” Stephen Hawking said in 1996, “I see no reason to abandon the continuum theories that have been so successful.”

(b) Will there be an infinite amount of time in the future? Probably. According to the classical theory of the Big Bang, the answer depends on whether events will keep occurring. The best estimate from the cosmologists these days is that the expansion of the universe is accelerating and will continue forever. There always will be the events of galaxy clusters getting farther apart, even though gravity will continue to compact much of the matter into black holes, and so the future is potentially infinite.

(c) Was there an infinite amount of time in the past? Aristotle argued “yes.” But by invoking the radical notion that God is “outside of time,” St. Augustine disagreed and said, “Time itself being part of God’s creation, there was simply no before!” (that is, no time before God created everything else but Himself). So, for theological reasons, Augustine declared time had a finite past. After advances in astronomy in the late 19th and early 20th centuries, the question of the age of the universe became a scientific question. With the acceptance of the classical Big Bang theory, the amount of past time was judged to be less than 14 billion years because this is when the Big Bang began. The assumption is that time does not exist independently of the spacetime relations exhibited by physical events. Recently, however, the classical Big Bang theory has been challenged. There could be an infinite amount of time in the past according to some proposed, but as yet untested, theories of quantum gravity based on the assumptions that general relativity theory fails to hold for infinitesimal volumes. These theories imply that the beginning of the Big Bang was actually an inflationary expansion from a pre-existing physical state. There was never a singularity. In that case our Big Bang could be just one bang among other bangs in a multiverse or landscape. If so, then is the past of this multiverse finite or infinite? Cosmologists do not agree on that issue. For a discussion of the controversies, see (Veneziano, 2006) and (Nadis, 2013).

There have been interesting speculations on how conscious life could continue forever, despite the fact that the available energy for life will decrease as the universe expands, and despite the fact that any life swept up into a black hole will reach the center of the hole in a finite time at which point death will be certain. For an introduction to these speculations, see (Krauss and Starkman, 2002).

Continuity of Time

In the classical theories of relativity and quantum mechanics, time is not quantized, but is a continuum. However, if certain, as yet untested, theories attempting to unify relativity and quantum mechanics are correct, then there is a shortest duration for any possible event (about 10-43 second), and time is digital rather than analog.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.

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