The Evidential Problem of Evil

The evidential problem of evil is the problem of determining whether and, if so, to what extent the existence of evil (or certain instances, kinds, quantities, or distributions of evil) constitutes evidence against the existence of God, that is to say, a being perfect in power, knowledge and goodness. Evidential arguments from evil attempt to show that, once we put aside any evidence there might be in support of the existence of God, it becomes unlikely, if not highly unlikely, that the world was created and is governed by an omnipotent, omniscient, and wholly good being. Such arguments are not to be confused with logical arguments from evil, which have the more ambitious aim of showing that, in a world in which there is evil, it is logically impossible—and not just unlikely—that God exists.

This entry begins by clarifying some important concepts and distinctions associated with the problem of evil, before providing an outline of one of the more forceful and influential evidential arguments developed in contemporary times, namely, the evidential argument advanced by William Rowe. Rowe’s argument has occasioned a range of responses from theists, including the so-called "skeptical theist" critique (according to which God’s ways are too mysterious for us to comprehend) and the construction of various theodicies, that is, explanations as to why God permits evil. These and other responses to the evidential problem of evil are here surveyed and assessed.

Table of Contents

  1. Background to the Problem of Evil
    1. Orthodox Theism
    2. Good and Evil
    3. Versions of the Problem of Evil
  2. William Rowe’s Evidential Argument from Evil
    1. An Outline of Rowe’s Evidential Argument
    2. The Theological Premise
    3. The Factual Premise
      1. Rowe’s Case in Support of the Factual Premise
      2. The Inference from P to Q
  3. The Skeptical Theist Response
    1. Wykstra’s CORNEA Critique
    2. Wykstra’s Parent Analogy
    3. Alston’s Analogies
  4. Building a Theodicy, or Casting Light on the Ways of God
    1. What is a Theodicy?
    2. Distinguishing a "Theodicy" from a "Defence"
    3. Sketch of a Theodicy
  5. Further Responses to the Evidential Problem of Evil
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Background to the Problem of Evil

Before delving into the deep and often murky waters of the problem of evil, it will be helpful to provide some philosophical background to this venerable subject. The first and perhaps most important step of this stage-setting process will be to identify and clarify the conception of God that is normally presupposed in contemporary debates (at least within the Anglo-American analytic tradition) on the problem of evil. The next step will involve providing an outline of some important concepts and distinctions, in particular the age-old distinction between "good" and "evil," and the more recent distinction between the logical problem of evil and the evidential problem of evil.

a. Orthodox Theism

The predominant conception of God within the western world, and hence the kind of deity that is normally the subject of debate in discussions on the problem of evil in most western philosophical circles, is the God of "orthodox theism." According to orthodox theism, there exists just one God, this God being a person or person-like. The operative notion, however, behind this form of theism is that God is perfect, where to be perfect is to be the greatest being possible or, to borrow Anselm’s well-known phrase, the being than which none greater can be conceived. (Such a conception of God forms the starting-point in what has come to be known as "perfect being theology"; see Morris 1987, 1991, and Rogers 2000). On this view, God, as an absolutely perfect being, must possess the following perfections or great-making qualities:

  1. omnipotence: This refers to God’s ability to bring about any state of affairs that is logically possible in itself as well as logically consistent with his other essential attributes.
  2. omniscience: God is omniscient in that he knows all truths or knows all that is logically possible to know.
  3. perfect goodness: God is the source of moral norms (as in divine command ethics) or always acts in complete accordance with moral norms.
  4. aseity: God has aseity (literally, being from oneself, a se esse) – that is to say, he is self-existent or ontologically independent, for he does not depend either for his existence or for his characteristics on anything outside himself.
  5. incorporeality: God has no body; he is a non-physical spirit but is capable of affecting physical things.
  6. eternity: Traditionally, God is thought to be eternal in an atemporal sense—that is, God is timeless or exists outside of time (a view upheld by Augustine, Boethius, and Aquinas). On an alternative view, God’s eternality is held to be temporal in nature, so that God is everlasting or exists in time, having infinite temporal duration in both of the two temporal directions.
  7. omnipresence: God is wholly present in all space and time. This is often interpreted metaphorically to mean that God can bring about an event immediately at any place and time, and knows what is happening at every place and time in the same immediate manner.
  8. perfectly free: God is absolutely free either in the sense that nothing outside him can determine him to perform a particular action, or in the sense that it is always within his power not to do what he does.
  9. alone worthy of worship and unconditional commitment: God, being the greatest being possible, is the only being fit to be worshipped and the only being to whom one may commit one’s life without reservation.

The God of traditional theism is also typically accorded a further attribute, one that he is thought to possess only contingently:

  1. creator and sustainer of the world: God brought the (physical and non-physical) world into existence, and also keeps the world and every object within it in existence. Thus, no created thing could exist at a given moment unless it were at that moment held in existence by God. Further, no created thing could have the causal powers and liabilities it has at a given moment unless it were at that moment supplied with those powers and liabilities by God.

According to orthodox theism, God was free not to create a world. In other words, there is at least one possible world in which God creates nothing at all. But then God is a creator only contingently, not necessarily. (For a more comprehensive account of the properties of the God of orthodox theism, see Swinburne 1977, Quinn & Taliaferro 1997: 223-319, and Hoffman & Rosenkrantz 2002.)

b. Good and Evil

Clarifying the underlying conception of God is but the first step in clarifying the nature of the problem of evil. To arrive at a more complete understanding of this vexing problem, it is necessary to unpack further some of its philosophical baggage. I turn, therefore, to some important concepts and distinctions associated with the problem of evil, beginning with the ideas of "good" and "evil."

The terms "good" and "evil" are, if nothing else, notoriously difficult to define. Some account, however, can be given of these terms as they are employed in discussions of the problem of evil. Beginning with the notion of evil, this is normally given a very wide extension so as to cover everything that is negative and destructive in life. The ambit of evil will therefore include such categories as the bad, the unjust, the immoral, and the painful. An analysis of evil in this broad sense may proceed as follows:

An event may be categorized as evil if it involves any of the following:

  1. some harm (whether it be minor or great) being done to the physical and/or psychological well-being of a sentient creature;
  2. the unjust treatment of some sentient creature;
  3. loss of opportunity resulting from premature death;
  4. anything that prevents an individual from leading a fulfilling and virtuous life;
  5. a person doing that which is morally wrong;
  6. the "privation of good."

Condition (a) captures what normally falls under the rubric of pain as a physical state (for example, the sensation you feel when you have a toothache or broken jaw) and suffering as a mental state in which we wish that our situation were otherwise (for example, the experience of anxiety or despair). Condition (b) introduces the notion of injustice, so that the prosperity of the wicked, the demise of the virtuous, and the denial of voting rights or employment opportunities to women and blacks would count as evils. The third condition is intended to cover cases of untimely death, that is to say, death not brought about by the ageing process alone. Death of this kind may result in loss of opportunity either in the sense that one is unable to fulfill one’s potential, dreams or goals, or merely in the sense that one is prevented from living out the full term of their natural life. This is partly why we consider it a great evil if an infant were killed after impacting with a train at full speed, even if the infant experienced no pain or suffering in the process. Condition (d) classifies as evil anything that inhibits one from leading a life that is both fulfilling and virtuous – poverty and prostitution would be cases in point. Condition (e) relates evil to immoral choices or acts. And the final condition expresses the idea, prominent in Augustine and Aquinas, that evil is not a substance or entity in its own right, but a privatio boni: the absence or lack of some good power or quality which a thing by its nature ought to possess.

Paralleling the above analysis of evil, the following account of "good" may be offered:

An event may be categorized as good if it involves any of the following:

  1. some improvement (whether it be minor or great) in the physical and/or psychological well-being of a sentient creature;
  2. the just treatment of some sentient creature;
  3. anything that advances the degree of fulfillment and virtue in an individual’s life;
  4. a person doing that which is morally right;
  5. the optimal functioning of some person or thing, so that it does not lack the full measure of being and goodness that ought to belong to it.

Turning to the many varieties of evil, the following have become standard in the literature:

Moral evil. This is evil that results from the misuse of free will on the part of some moral agent in such a way that the agent thereby becomes morally blameworthy for the resultant evil. Moral evil therefore includes specific acts of intentional wrongdoing such as lying and murdering, as well as defects in character such as dishonesty and greed.

Natural evil. In contrast to moral evil, natural evil is evil that results from the operation of natural processes, in which case no human being can be held morally accountable for the resultant evil. Classic examples of natural evil are natural disasters such as cyclones and earthquakes that result in enormous suffering and loss of life, illnesses such as leukemia and Alzheimer’s, and disabilities such as blindness and deafness.

An important qualification, however, must be made at this point. A great deal of what normally passes as natural evil is brought about by human wrongdoing or negligence. For example, lung cancer may be caused by heavy smoking; the loss of life occasioned by some earthquakes may be largely due to irresponsible city planners locating their creations on faults that will ultimately heave and split; and some droughts and floods may have been prevented if not for the careless way we have treated our planet. As it is the misuse of free will that has caused these evils or contributed to their occurrence, it seems best to regard them as moral evils and not natural evils. In the present work, therefore, a natural evil will be defined as an evil resulting solely or chiefly from the operation of the laws of nature. Alternatively, and perhaps more precisely, an evil will be deemed a natural evil only if no non-divine agent can be held morally responsible for its occurrence. Thus, a flood caused by human pollution of the environment will be categorized a natural evil as long as the agents involved could not be held morally responsible for the resultant evil, which would be the case if, for instance, they could not reasonably be expected to have foreseen the consequences of their behavior.

A further category of evil that has recently played an important role in discussions on the problem of evil is horrendous evil. This may be defined, following Marilyn Adams (1999: 26), as evil “the participation in which (that is, the doing or suffering of which) constitutes prima facie reason to doubt whether the participant’s life could (given their inclusion in it) be a great good to him/her on the whole." As examples of such evil, Adams lists “the rape of a woman and axing off of her arms, psycho-physical torture whose ultimate goal is the disintegration of personality, betrayal of one’s deepest loyalties, child abuse of the sort described by Ivan Karamazov, child pornography, parental incest, slow death by starvation, the explosion of nuclear bombs over populated areas” (p.26).

A horrendous evil, it may be noted, may be either a moral evil (for example, the Holocaust of 1939-45) or a natural evil (for example, the Lisbon earthquake of 1755). It is also important to note that it is the notion of a "horrendous moral evil" that comports with the current, everyday use of "evil" by English speakers. When we ordinarily employ the word "evil" today we do not intend to pick out something that is merely bad or very wrong (for example, a burglary), nor do we intend to refer to the death and destruction brought about by purely natural processes (we do not, for example, think of the 2004 Asian tsunami disaster as something that was "evil"). Instead, the word "evil" is reserved in common usage for events and people that have an especially horrific moral quality or character.

Clearly, the problem of evil is at its most difficult when stated in terms of horrendous evil (whether of the moral or natural variety), and as will be seen in Section II below, this is precisely how William Rowe’s statement of the evidential problem of evil is formulated.

Finally, these notions of good and evil indicate that the problem of evil is intimately tied to ethics. One’s underlying ethical theory may have a bearing on one’s approach to the problem of evil in at least two ways.

Firstly, one who accepts either a divine command theory of ethics or non-realism in ethics is in no position to raise the problem of evil, that is, to offer the existence of evil as at least a prima facie good reason for rejecting theism. This is because a divine command theory, in taking morality to be dependent upon the will of God, already assumes the truth of that which is in dispute, namely, the existence of God (see Brown 1967). On the other hand, non-realist ethical theories, such as moral subjectivism and error-theories of ethics, hold that there are no objectively true moral judgments. But then a non-theist who also happens to be a non-realist in ethics cannot help herself to some of the central premises found in evidential arguments from evil (such as "If there were a perfectly good God, he would want a world with no horrific evil in it"), as these purport to be objectively true moral judgments (see Nelson 1991). This is not to say, however, that atheologians such as David Hume, Bertrand Russell and J.L. Mackie, each of whom supported non-realism in ethics, were contradicting their own meta-ethics when raising arguments from evil – at least if their aim was only to show up a contradiction in the theist’s set of beliefs.

Secondly, the particular normative ethical theory one adopts (for example, consequentialism, deontology, virtue ethics) may influence the way in which one formulates or responds to an argument from evil. Indeed, some have gone so far as to claim that evidential arguments from evil usually presuppose the truth of consequentialism (see, for example, Reitan 2000). Even if this is not so, it seems that the adoption of a particular theory in normative ethics may render the problem of evil easier or harder, or at least delimit the range of solutions available. (For an excellent account of the difficulties faced by theists in relation to the problem of evil when the ethical framework is restricted to deontology, see McNaughton 1994.)

c. Versions of the Problem of Evil

The problem of evil may be described as the problem of reconciling belief in God with the existence of evil. But the problem of evil, like evil itself, has many faces. It may, for example, be expressed either as an experiential problem or as a theoretical problem. In the former case, the problem is the difficulty of adopting or maintaining an attitude of love and trust toward God when confronted by evil that is deeply perplexing and disturbing. Alvin Plantinga (1977: 63-64) provides an eloquent account of this problem:

The theist may find a religious problem in evil; in the presence of his own suffering or that of someone near to him he may find it difficult to maintain what he takes to be the proper attitude towards God. Faced with great personal suffering or misfortune, he may be tempted to rebel against God, to shake his fist in God’s face, or even to give up belief in God altogether… Such a problem calls, not for philosophical enlightenment, but for pastoral care. (emphasis in the original)

By contrast, the theoretical problem of evil is the purely "intellectual" matter of determining what impact, if any, the existence of evil has on the truth-value or the epistemic status of theistic belief. To be sure, these two problems are interconnected – theoretical considerations, for example, may color one’s actual experience of evil, as happens when suffering that is better comprehended becomes easier to bear. In this article, however, the focus will be exclusively on the theoretical dimension. This aspect of the problem of evil comes in two broad varieties: the logical problem and the evidential problem.

The logical version of the problem of evil (also known as the a priori version and the deductive version) is the problem of removing an alleged logical inconsistency between certain claims about God and certain claims about evil. J.L. Mackie (1955: 200) provides a succinct statement of this problem:

In its simplest form the problem is this: God is omnipotent; God is wholly good; and yet evil exists. There seems to be some contradiction between these three propositions, so that if any two of them were true the third would be false. But at the same time all three are essential parts of most theological positions: the theologian, it seems, at once must adhere and cannot consistently adhere to all three. (emphases in the original)

In a similar vein, H.J. McCloskey (1960: 97) frames the problem of evil as follows:

Evil is a problem for the theist in that a contradiction is involved in the fact of evil, on the one hand, and the belief in the omnipotence and perfection of God on the other. (emphasis mine)

Atheologians like Mackie and McCloskey, in maintaining that the logical problem of evil provides conclusive evidence against theism, are claiming that theists are committed to an internally inconsistent set of beliefs and hence that theism is necessarily false. More precisely, it is claimed that theists commonly accept the following propositions:

  1. God exists
  2. God is omnipotent
  3. God is omniscient
  4. God is perfectly good
  5. Evil exists.

Propositions (11)-(14) form an essential part of the orthodox conception of God, as this has been explicated in Section 1 above. But theists typically believe that the world contains evil. The charge, then, is that this commitment to (15) is somehow incompatible with the theist’s commitment to (11)-(14). Of course, (15) can be specified in a number of ways – for example, (15) may refer to the existence of any evil at all, or a certain amount of evil, or particular kinds of evil, or some perplexing distributions of evil. In each case, a different version of the logical problem of evil, and hence a distinct charge of logical incompatibility, will be generated.

The alleged incompatibility, however, is not obvious or explicit. Rather, the claim is that propositions (11)-(15) are implicitly contradictory, where a set S of propositions is implicitly contradictory if there is a necessary proposition p such that the conjunction of p with S constitutes a formally contradictory set. Those who advance logical arguments from evil must therefore add one or more necessary truths to the above set of five propositions in order to generate the fatal contradiction. By way of illustration, consider the following additional propositions that may be offered:

  1. A perfectly good being would want to prevent all evils.
  2. An omniscient being knows every way in which evils can come into existence.
  3. An omnipotent being who knows every way in which an evil can come into existence has the power to prevent that evil from coming into existence.
  4. A being who knows every way in which an evil can come into existence, who is able to prevent that evil from coming into existence, and who wants to do so, would prevent the existence of that evil.

From this set of auxiliary propositions, it clearly follows that

  1. If there exists an omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good being, then no evil exists.

It is not difficult to see how the addition of (16)-(20) to (11)-(15) will yield an explicit contradiction, namely,

  1. Evil exists and evil does not exist.

If such an argument is sound, theism will not so much lack evidential support, but would rather be, as Mackie (1955: 200) puts it, “positively irrational.” For more discussion, see the article The Logical Problem of Evil.

The subject of this article, however, is the evidential version of the problem of evil (also called the a posteriori version and the inductive version), which seeks to show that the existence evil, although logically consistent with the existence of God, counts against the truth of theism. As with the logical problem, evidential formulations may be based on the sheer existence of evil, or certain instances, types, amounts, or distributions of evil. Evidential arguments from evil may also be classified according to whether they employ (i) a direct inductive approach, which aims at showing that evil counts against theism, but without comparing theism to some alternative hypothesis; or (ii) an indirect inductive approach, which attempts to show that some significant set of facts about evil counts against theism, and it does this by identifying an alternative hypothesis that explains these facts far more adequately than the theistic hypothesis. The former strategy, as will be seen in Section II, is employed by William Rowe, while the latter strategy is exemplified best in Paul Draper’s 1989 paper, “Pain and Pleasure: An Evidential Problem for Theists”. (A useful taxonomy of evidential arguments from evil can be found in Russell 1996: 194 and Peterson 1998: 23-27, 69-72.)

Evidential arguments purport to show that evil counts against theism in the sense that the existence of evil lowers the probability that God exists. The strategy here is to begin by putting aside any positive evidence we might think there is in support of theism (for example, the fine-tuning argument) as well as any negative evidence we might think there is against theism (that is, any negative evidence other than the evidence of evil). We therefore begin with a "level playing field" by setting the probability of God’s existing at 0.5 and the probability of God’s not existing at 0.5 (compare Rowe 1996: 265-66; it is worth noting, however, that this "level playing field" assumption is not entirely uncontroversial: see, for example, the objections raised by Jordan 2001 and Otte 2002: 167-68). The aim is to then determine what happens to the probability value of "God exists" once we consider the evidence generated by our observations of the various evils in our world. The central question, therefore, is: Grounds for belief in God aside, does evil render the truth of atheism more likely than the truth of theism? (A recent debate on the evidential problem of evil was couched in such terms: see Rowe 2001a: 124-25.) Proponents of evidential arguments are therefore not claiming that, even if we take into account any positive reasons there are in support of theism, the evidence of evil still manages to lower the probability of God’s existence. They are only making the weaker claim that, if we temporarily set aside such positive reasons, then it can be shown that the evils that occur in our world push the probability of God’s existence significantly downward.

But if evil counts against theism by driving down the probability value of "God exists" then evil constitutes evidence against the existence of God. Evidential arguments, therefore, claim that there are certain facts about evil that cannot be adequately explained on a theistic account of the world. Theism is thus treated as a large-scale hypothesis or explanatory theory which aims to make sense of some pertinent facts, and to the extent that it fails to do so it is disconfirmed.

In evidential arguments, however, the evidence only probabilifies its conclusion, rather than conclusively verifying it. The probabilistic nature of such arguments manifests itself in the form of a premise to the effect that "It is probably the case that some instance (or type, or amount, or pattern) of evil E is gratuitous." This probability judgment usually rests on the claim that, even after careful reflection, we can see no good reason for God’s permission of E. The inference from this claim to the judgment that there exists gratuitous evil is inductive in nature, and it is this inductive step that sets the evidential argument apart from the logical argument.

2. William Rowe’s Evidential Argument from Evil

Evidential arguments from evil seek to show that the presence of evil in the world inductively supports or makes likely the claim that God (or, more precisely, the God of orthodox theism) does not exist. A variety of evidential arguments have been formulated in recent years, but here I will concentrate on one very influential formulation, namely, that provided by William Rowe. Rowe’s version of the evidential argument has received much attention since its formal inception in 1978, for it is often considered to be the most cogent presentation of the evidential problem of evil. James Sennett (1993: 220), for example, views Rowe’s argument as “the clearest, most easily understood, and most intuitively appealing of those available.” Terry Christlieb (1992: 47), likewise, thinks of Rowe’s argument as “the strongest sort of evidential argument, the sort that has the best chance of success.” It is important to note, however, that Rowe’s thinking on the evidential problem of evil has developed in significant ways since his earliest writings on the subject, and two (if not three) distinct evidential arguments can be identified in his work. Here I will only discuss that version of Rowe’s argument that received its first full-length formulation in Rowe (1978) and, most famously, in Rowe (1979), and was successively refined in the light of criticisms in Rowe (1986), (1988), (1991), and (1995), before being abandoned in favour of a quite different evidential argument in Rowe (1996).

a. An Outline of Rowe’s Argument

In presenting his evidential argument from evil in his justly celebrated 1979 paper, “The Problem of Evil and Some Varieties of Atheism”, Rowe thinks it best to focus on a particular kind of evil that is found in our world in abundance. He therefore selects “intense human and animal suffering” as this occurs on a daily basis, is in great plenitude in our world, and is a clear case of evil. More precisely, it is a case of intrinsic evil: it is bad in and of itself, even though it sometimes is part of, or leads to, some good state of affairs (Rowe 1979: 335). Rowe then proceeds to state his argument for atheism as follows:

  1. There exist instances of intense suffering which an omnipotent, omniscient being could have prevented without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse.
  2. An omniscient, wholly good being would prevent the occurrence of any intense suffering it could, unless it could not do so without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse.
  3. (Therefore) There does not exist an omnipotent, omniscient, wholly good being. (Rowe 1979: 336)

This argument, as Rowe points out, is clearly valid, and so if there are rational grounds for accepting its premises, to that extent there are rational grounds for accepting the conclusion, that is to say, atheism.

b. The Theological Premise

The second premise is sometimes called "the theological premise" as it expresses a belief about what God as a perfectly good being would do under certain circumstances. In particular, this premise states that if such a being knew of some intense suffering that was about to take place and was in a position to prevent its occurrence, then it would prevent it unless it could not do so without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse. Put otherwise, an omnipotent, omniscient, wholly good God would not permit any gratuitous evil, evil that is (roughly speaking) avoidable, pointless, or unnecessary with respect to the fulfillment of God’s purposes.

Rowe takes the theological premise to be the least controversial aspect of his argument. And the consensus seems to be that Rowe is right – the theological premise, or a version thereof that is immune from some minor infelicities in the original formulation, is usually thought to be indisputable, self-evident, necessarily true, or something of that ilk. The intuition here, as the Howard-Snyders (1999: 115) explain, is that “on the face of it, the idea that God may well permit gratuitous evil is absurd. After all, if God can get what He wants without permitting some particular horror (or anything comparably bad), why on earth would He permit it?”

An increasing number of theists, however, are beginning to question Rowe’s theological premise. This way of responding to the evidential problem of evil has been described by Rowe as “radical, if not revolutionary” (1991: 79), but it is viewed by many theists as the only way to remain faithful to the common human experience of evil, according to which utterly gratuitous evil not only exists but is abundant. In particular, some members of the currently popular movement known as open theism have rallied behind the idea that the theistic worldview is not only compatible with, but requires or demands, the possibility that there is gratuitous evil (for the movement’s "manifesto," see Pinnock et al. 1994; see also Sanders 1998, Boyd 2000, and Hasker 2004).

Although open theists accept the orthodox conception of God, as delineated in Section 1.a above, they offer a distinct account of some of the properties that are constitutive of the orthodox God. Most importantly, open theists interpret God’s omniscience in such a way that it does not include either foreknowledge (or, more specifically, knowledge of what free agents other than God will do) or middle knowledge (that is, knowledge of what every possible free creature would freely choose to do in any possible situation in which that creature might find itself). This view is usually contrasted with two other forms of orthodox theism: Molinism (named after the sixteenth-century Jesuit theologian Luis de Molina, who developed the theory of middle knowledge), according to which divine omniscience encompasses both foreknowledge and middle knowledge; and Calvinism or theological determinism, according to which God determines or predestines all that happens, thus leaving us with either no morally relevant free will at all (hard determinism) or free will of the compatibilist sort only (soft determinism).

It is often thought that the Molinist and Calvinist grant God greater providential control over the world than does the open theist. For according to the latter but not the former, the future is to some degree open-ended in that not even God can know exactly how it will turn out, given that he has created a world in which there are agents with libertarian free will and, perhaps, indeterminate natural processes. God therefore runs the risk that his creation will come to be infested with gratuitous evils, that is to say, evils he has not intended, decreed, planned for, or even permitted for the sake of some greater good. Open theists, however, argue that this risk is kept in check by God’s adoption of various general strategies by which he governs the world. God may, for example, set out to create a world in which there are creatures who have the opportunity to freely choose their destiny, but he would then ensure that adequate recompense is offered (perhaps in an afterlife) to those whose lives are ruined (through no fault of their own) by the misuse of others’ freedom (for example, a child that is raped and murdered). Nevertheless, in creating creatures with (libertarian) free will and by infusing the natural order with a degree of indeterminacy, God relinquishes exhaustive knowledge and complete control of all history. The open theist therefore encourages the rejection of what has been called "meticulous providence" (Peterson 1982: chs 4 & 5) or "the blueprint worldview" (Boyd 2003: ch.2), the view that the world was created according to a detailed divine blueprint which assigns a specific divine reason for every occurrence in history. In place of this view, the open theist presents us with a God who is a risk-taker, a God who gives up meticulous control of everything that happens, thus opening himself up to the genuine possibility of failure and disappointment – that is to say, to the possibility of gratuitous evil.

Open theism has sparked much heated debate and has been attacked from many quarters. Considered, however, as a response to Rowe’s theological premise, open theism’s prospects seem dim. The problem here, as critics have frequently pointed out, is that the open view of God tends to diminish one’s confidence in God’s ability to ensure that his purposes for an individual’s life, or for world history, will be accomplished (see, for example, Ware 2000, Ascol 2001: 176-80). The worry is that if, as open theists claim, God does not exercise sovereign control over the world and the direction of human history is open-ended, then it seems that the world is left to the mercy of Tyche or Fortuna, and we are therefore left with no assurance that God’s plan for the world and for us will succeed. Consider, for example, Eleonore Stump’s rhetorical questions, put in response to the idea of a "God of chance" advocated in van Inwagen (1988): “Could one trust such a God with one’s child, one’s life? Could one say, as the Psalmist does, "I will both lay me down in peace and sleep, for thou, Lord, only makest me dwell in safety’?” (1997: 466, quoting from Psalm 4:8). The answer may in large part depend on the degree to which the world is thought to be imbued with indeterminacy or chance.

If, for example, the open theist view introduces a high level of chance into God’s creation, this would raise the suspicion that the open view reflects an excessively deistic conception of God’s relation to the world. Deism is popularly thought of as the view that a supreme being created the world but then, like an absentee landlord, left it to run on its own accord. Deists, therefore, are often accused of postulating a remote and indifferent God, one who does not exercise providential care over his creation. Such a deity, it might be objected, resembles the open theist’s God of chance. The objection, in other words, is that open theists postulate a dark and risky universe subject to the forces of blind chance, and that it is difficult to imagine a personal God—that is, a God who seeks to be personally related to us and hence wants us to develop attitudes of love and trust towards him—providing us with such a habitat. To paraphrase Einstein, God does not play dice with our lives.

This, however, need not mean that God does not play dice at all. It is not impossible, in other words, to accommodate chance within a theistic world-view. To see this, consider a particular instance of moral evil: the rape and murder of a little girl. It seems plausible that no explanation is available as to why God would permit this specific evil (or, more precisely, why God would permit this girl to suffer then and there and in that way), since any such explanation that is offered will inevitably recapitulate the explanation offered for at least one of the major evil-kinds that subsumes the particular evil in question (for example, the class of moral evils). It is therefore unreasonable to request a reason (even a possible reason) for God’s permission of a particular event that is specific to this event and that goes beyond some general policy or plan God might have for permitting events of that kind. If this correct, then there is room for theists to accept the view that at least some evils are chancy or gratuitous in the sense that there is no specific reason as to why these evils are permitted by God. However, this kind of commitment to gratuitous evil is entirely innocuous for proponents of Rowe’s theological premise. For one can simply modify this premise so that it ranges either over particular instances of evil or (to accommodate cases where particular evils admit of no divine justification) over broadly defined evils or evil-kinds under which the relevant particular evils can be subsumed. And so a world created by God may be replete with gratuitous evil, as open theists imagine, but that need not present a problem for Rowe.

(For a different line of argument in support of the compatibility of theism and gratuitous evil, see Hasker (2004: chs 4 & 5), who argues that the consequences for morality would be disastrous if we took Rowe’s theological premise to be true. For criticisms of this view, see Rowe (1991: 79-86), Chrzan (1994), O’Connor (1998: 53-70), and Daniel and Frances Howard-Snyder (1999: 119-27).)

c. The Factual Premise

Criticisms of Rowe’s argument tend to focus on its first premise, sometimes dubbed "the factual premise," as it purports to state a fact about the world. Briefly put, the fact in question is that there exist instances of intense suffering which are gratuitous or pointless. As indicated above, an instance of suffering is gratuitous, according to Rowe, if an omnipotent, omniscient being could have prevented it without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse. A gratuitous evil, in this sense, is a state of affairs that is not (logically) necessary to the attainment of a greater good or to the prevention of an evil at least as bad.

i Rowe’s Case in Support of the Factual Premise

Rowe builds his case in support of the factual premise by appealing to particular instances of human and animal suffering, such as the following:

E1: the case of Bambi
“In some distant forest lightning strikes a dead tree, resulting in a forest fire. In the fire a fawn is trapped, horribly burned, and lies in terrible agony for several days before death relieves its suffering” (Rowe 1979: 337).

Although this is presented as a hypothetical event, Rowe takes it to be “a familiar sort of tragedy, played not infrequently on the stage of nature” (1988: 119).

E2: the case of Sue
This is an actual event in which a five-year-old girl in Flint, Michigan was severely beaten, raped and then strangled to death early on New Year’s Day in 1986. The case was introduced by Bruce Russell (1989: 123), whose account of it, drawn from a report in the Detroit Free Press of January 3 1986, runs as follows:

The girl’s mother was living with her boyfriend, another man who was unemployed, her two children, and her 9-month old infant fathered by the boyfriend. On New Year’s Eve all three adults were drinking at a bar near the woman’s home. The boyfriend had been taking drugs and drinking heavily. He was asked to leave the bar at 8:00 p.m. After several reappearances he finally stayed away for good at about 9:30 p.m. The woman and the unemployed man remained at the bar until 2:00 a.m. at which time the woman went home and the man to a party at a neighbor’s home. Perhaps out of jealousy, the boyfriend attacked the woman when she walked into the house. Her brother was there and broke up the fight by hitting the boyfriend who was passed out and slumped over a table when the brother left. Later the boyfriend attacked the woman again, and this time she knocked him unconscious. After checking the children, she went to bed. Later the woman’s 5-year old girl went downstairs to go to the bathroom. The unemployed man returned from the party at 3:45 a.m. and found the 5-year old dead. She had been raped, severely beaten over most of her body and strangled to death by the boyfriend.

Following Rowe (1988: 120), the case of the fawn will be referred to as "E1", and the case of the little girl as "E2". Further, following William Alston’s (1991: 32) practice, the fawn will be named "Bambi" and the little girl "Sue".

Rowe (1996: 264) states that, in choosing to focus on E1 and E2, he is “trying to pose a serious difficulty for the theist by picking a difficult case of natural evil, E1 (Bambi), and a difficult case of moral evil, E2 (Sue).” Rowe, then, is attempting to state the evidential argument in the strongest possible terms. As one commentator has put it, “if these cases of evil [E1 and E2] are not evidence against theism, then none are” (Christlieb 1992: 47). However, Rowe’s almost exclusive preoccupation with these two instances of suffering must be placed within the context of his belief (as expressed in, for example, 1979: 337-38) that even if we discovered that God could not have eliminated E1 and E2 without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse, it would still be unreasonable to believe this of all cases of horrendous evil occurring daily in our world. E1 and E2 are thus best viewed as representative of a particular class of evil which poses a specific problem for theistic belief. This problem is expressed by Rowe in the following way:

(P) No good state of affairs we know of is such that an omnipotent, omniscient being’s obtaining it would morally justify that being’s permitting E1 or E2. Therefore,

(Q) It is likely that no good state of affairs is such that an omnipotent, omniscient being’s obtaining it would morally justify that being in permitting E1 or E2.

P states that no good we know of justifies God in permitting E1 and E2. From this it is inferred that Q is likely to be true, or that probably there are no goods which justify God in permitting E1 and E2. Q, of course, corresponds to the factual premise of Rowe’s argument. Thus, Rowe attempts to establish the truth of the factual premise by appealing to P.

ii. The Inference from P to Q

At least one question to be addressed when considering this inference is: What exactly do P and Q assert? Beginning with P, the central notion here is "a good state of affairs we know of." But what is it to know of a good state of affairs? According to Rowe (1988: 123), to know of a good state of affairs is to (a) conceive of that state of affairs, and (b) recognize that it is intrinsically good (examples of states that are intrinsically good include pleasure, happiness, love, and the exercise of virtue). Rowe (1996: 264) therefore instructs us to not limit the set of goods we know of to goods that we know have occurred in the past or to goods that we know will occur in the future. The set of goods we know of must also include goods that we have some grasp of, even if we do not know whether they have occurred or ever will occur. For example, such a good, in the case of Sue, may consist of the experience of eternal bliss in the hereafter. Even though we lack a clear grasp of what this good involves, and even though we cannot be sure that such a good will ever obtain, we do well to include this good amongst the goods we know of. A good that we know of, however, cannot justify God in permitting E1 or E2 unless that good is actualized at some time.

On what grounds does Rowe think that P is true? Rowe (1988: 120) states that “we have good reason to believe that no good state of affairs we know of would justify an omnipotent, omniscient being in permitting either E1 or E2” (emphasis his). The good reason in question consists of the fact that the good states of affairs we know of, when reflecting on them, meet one or both of the following conditions: either an omnipotent being could obtain them without having to permit E1 or E2, or obtaining them would not morally justify that being in permitting E1 or E2 (Rowe 1988: 121, 123; 1991: 72).

This brings us, finally, to Rowe’s inference from P to Q. This is, of course, an inductive inference. Rowe does not claim to know or be able to prove that cases of intense suffering such as the fawn’s are indeed pointless. For as he acknowledges, it is quite possible that there is some familiar good outweighing the fawn’s suffering and which is connected to that suffering in a way unbeknown to us. Or there may be goods we are not aware of, to which the fawn’s suffering is intimately connected. But although we do not know or cannot establish the truth of Q, we do possess rational grounds for accepting Q, and these grounds consist of the considerations adumbrated in P. Thus, the truth of P is taken to provide strong evidence for the truth of Q (Rowe 1979: 337).

3. The Skeptical Theist Response

Theism, particularly as expressed within the Judeo-Christian and Islamic religions, has always emphasized the inscrutability of the ways of God. In Romans 11:33-34, for example, the apostle Paul exclaims: “Oh, the depth of the riches of the wisdom and knowledge of God! How unsearchable his judgments, and his paths beyond tracing out! Who has known the mind of the Lord?” (NIV). This emphasis on mystery and the epistemic distance between God and human persons is a characteristic tenet of traditional forms of theism. It is in the context of this tradition that Stephen Wykstra developed his well-known CORNEA critique of Rowe’s evidential argument. The heart of Wykstra’s critique is that, given our cognitive limitations, we are in no position to judge as improbable the statement that there are goods beyond our ken secured by God’s permission of many of the evils we find in the world. This position – sometimes labelled "skeptical theism" or "defensive skepticism" – has generated a great deal of discussion, leading some to conclude that “the inductive argument from evil is in no better shape than its late lamented deductive cousin” (Alston 1991: 61). In this Section, I will review the challenge posed by this theistic form of skepticism, beginning with the critique advanced by Wykstra.

a. Wykstra’s CORNEA Critique

In an influential paper entitled, “The Humean Obstacle to Evidential Arguments from Evil,” Stephen Wykstra raised a formidable objection to Rowe’s inference from P to Q. Wykstra’s first step was to draw attention to the following epistemic principle, which he dubbed "CORNEA" (short for "Condition Of ReasoNable Epistemic Access"):

(C) On the basis of cognized situation s, human H is entitled to claim "It appears that p" only if it is reasonable for H to believe that, given her cognitive faculties and the use she has made of them, if p were not the case, s would likely be different than it is in some way discernible by her. (Wykstra 1984: 85)

The point behind CORNEA may be easier to grasp if (C) is simplified along the following lines:

(C*) H is entitled to infer "There is no x" from "So far as I can tell, there is no x" only if:

It is reasonable for H to believe that if there were an x, it is likely that she would perceive (or find, grasp, comprehend, conceive) it.

Adopting terminology introduced by Wykstra (1996), the inference from "So far as I can tell, there is no x" to "There is no x" may be called a "noseeum inference": we no see ’um, so they ain’t there! Further, the italicized portion in (C*) may be called "the noseeum assumption," as anyone who employs a noseeum inference and is justified in doing so would be committed to this assumption.

C*, or at least something quite like it, appears unobjectionable. If, for instance, I am looking through the window of my twentieth-floor office to the garden below and I fail to see any caterpillars on the flowers, that would hardly entitle me to infer that there are in fact no caterpillars there. Likewise, if a beginner were watching Kasparov play Deep Blue, it would be unreasonable for her to infer "I can’t see any way for Deep Blue to get out of check; so, there is none." Both inferences are illegitimate for the same reason: the person making the inference does not have what it takes to discern the sorts of things in question. It is this point that C* intends to capture by insisting that a noseeum inference is permissible only if it is likely that one would detect or discern the item in question if it existed.

But how does the foregoing relate to Rowe’s evidential argument? Notice, to begin with, that Rowe’s inference from P to Q is a noseeum inference. Rowe claims in P that, so far as we can see, no goods justify God’s permission of E1 and E2, and from this he infers that no goods whatever justify God’s permission of these evils. According to Wykstra, however, Rowe is entitled to make this noseeum inference only if he is entitled to make the following noseeum assumption:

If there are goods justifying God’s permission of horrendous evil, it is likely that we would discern or be cognizant of such goods.

Call this Rowe’s Noseeum Assumption, or RNA for short. The key issue, then, is whether we should accept RNA. Many theists, led by Stephen Wykstra, have claimed that RNA is false (or that we ought to suspend judgement about its truth). They argue that the great gulf between our limited cognitive abilities and the infinite wisdom of God prevents us (at least in many cases) from discerning God’s reasons for permitting evil. On this view, even if there are goods secured by God’s permission of evil, it is likely that these goods would be beyond our ken. Alvin Plantinga (1974: 10) sums up this position well with his rhetorical question: “Why suppose that if God does have a reason for permitting evil, the theist would be the first to know?” (emphasis his). Since theists such as Wykstra and Plantinga challenge Rowe’s argument (and evidential arguments in general) by focusing on the limits of human knowledge, they have become known as skeptical theists.

I will now turn to some considerations that have been offered by skeptical theists against RNA.

b. Wykstra’s Parent Analogy

Skeptical theists have drawn various analogies in an attempt to highlight the implausibility of RNA. The most common analogy, and the one favoured by Wykstra, involves a comparison between the vision and wisdom of an omniscient being such as God and the cognitive capacities of members of the human species. Clearly, the gap between God’s intellect and ours is immense, and Wykstra (1984: 87-91) compares it to the gap between the cognitive abilities of a parent and her one-month-old infant. But if this is the case, then even if there were outweighing goods connected in the requisite way to the instances of suffering appealed to by Rowe, that we should discern most of these goods is just as likely as that a one-month-old infant should discern most of her parents’ purposes for those pains they allow her to suffer – that is to say, it is not likely at all. Assuming that CORNEA is correct, Rowe would not then be entitled to claim, for any given instance of apparently pointless suffering, that it is indeed pointless. For as the above comparison between God’s intellect and the human mind indicates, even if there were outweighing goods served by certain instances of suffering, such goods would be beyond our ken. What Rowe has failed to see, according to Wykstra, is that “if we think carefully about the sort of being theism proposes for our belief, it is entirely expectable – given what we know of our cognitive limits – that the goods by virtue of which this Being allows known suffering should very often be beyond our ken” (1984: 91).

c. Alston’s Analogies

Rowe, like many others, has responded to Wykstra’s Parent Analogy by identifying a number of relevant disanalogies between a one-month-old infant and our predicament as adult human beings (see Rowe 1996: 275). There are, however, various other analogies that skeptical theists have employed in order to cast doubt on RNA. Here I will briefly consider a series of analogies that were first formulated by Alston (1996).

Like Wykstra, Alston (1996: 317) aims to highlight “the absurdity of the claim” that the fact that we cannot see what justifying reason an omniscient, omnipotent being might have for doing something provides strong support for the supposition that no such reason is available to that being. Alston, however, chooses to steer clear of the parent-child analogy employed by Wykstra, for he concedes that this contains loopholes that can be exploited in the ways suggested by Rowe.

Alston’s analogies fall into two groups, the first of which attempt to show that the insights attainable by finite, fallible human beings are not an adequate indication of what is available by way of reasons to an omniscient, omnipotent being. Suppose I am a first-year university physics student and I am faced with a theory of quantum phenomena, but I struggle to see why the author of the theory draws the conclusions she draws. Does that entitle me to suppose that she has no sufficient reason for her conclusions? Clearly not, for my inability to discern her reasons is only to be expected given my lack of expertise in the subject. Similarly, given my lack of training in painting, I fail to see why Picasso arranged the figures in Guernica as he did. But that does not entitle me to infer that he had no sufficient reason for doing so. Again, being a beginner in chess, I fail to see any reason why Kasparov made the move he did, but I would be foolish to conclude that he had no good reason to do so.

Alston applies the foregoing to the noseeum inference from "We cannot see any sufficient reason for God to permit E1 and E2" to "God has no sufficient reason to do so." In this case, as in the above examples, we are in no position to draw such a conclusion for we lack any reason to suppose that we have a sufficient grasp of the range of possible reasons open to the other party. Our grasp of the reasons God might have for his actions is thus comparable to the grasp of the neophyte in the other cases. Indeed, Alston holds that “the extent to which God can envisage reasons for permitting a given state of affairs exceeds our ability to do so by at least as much as Einstein’s ability to discern the reason for a physical theory exceeds the ability of one ignorant of physics” (1996: 318, emphasis his).

Alston’s second group of analogies seek to show that, in looking for the reasons God might have for certain acts or omissions, we are in effect trying to determine whether there is a so-and-so in a territory the extent and composition of which is largely unknown to us (or, at least, it is a territory such that we have no way of knowing the extent to which its constituents are unknown to us). Alston thus states that Rowe’s noseeum inference

…is like going from "We haven’t found any signs of life elsewhere in the universe" to "There isn’t life elsewhere in the universe." It is like someone who is culturally and geographically isolated going from "As far as I have been able to tell, there is nothing on earth beyond this forest" to "There is nothing on earth beyond this forest." Or, to get a bit more sophisticated, it is like someone who reasons "We are unable to discern anything beyond the temporal bounds of our universe," where those bounds are the big bang and the final collapse, to "There is nothing beyond the temporal bounds of our universe." (1996: 318)

Just as we lack a map of the relevant "territory" in these cases, we also lack a reliable internal map of the diversity of considerations that are available to an omniscient being in permitting instances of suffering. But given our ignorance of the extent, variety, or constitution of the terra incognita, it is surely the better part of wisdom to refrain from drawing any hasty conclusions regarding the nature of this territory.

Although such analogies may not be open to the same criticisms levelled against the analogies put forward by Wykstra, they are in the end no more successful than Wykstra’s analogies. Beginning with Alston’s first group of analogies, where a noseeum inference is unwarranted due to a lack of expertise, there is typically no expectation on the part of the neophyte that the reasons held by the other party (for example, the physicist’s reasons for drawing conclusion x, Kasparov’s reasons for making move x in a chess game) would be discernible to her. If you have just begun to study physics, you would not expect to understand Einstein’s reasons for advancing the special theory of relativity. However, if your five-year-old daughter suffered the fate of Sue as depicted in E2, would you not expect a perfectly loving being to reveal his reasons to you for allowing this to happen, or at least to comfort you by providing you with special assurances that that there is a reason why this terrible evil could not have been prevented? Rowe makes this point quite well:

Being finite beings we can’t expect to know all the goods God would know, any more than an amateur at chess should expect to know all the reasons for a particular move that Kasparov makes in a game. But, unlike Kasparov who in a chess match has a good reason not to tell us how a particular move fits into his plan to win the game, God, if he exists, isn’t playing chess with our lives. In fact, since understanding the goods for the sake of which he permits terrible evils to befall us would itself enable us to better bear our suffering, God has a strong reason to help us understand those goods and how they require his permission of the terrible evils that befall us. (2001b: 157)

There appears, then, to be an obligation on the part of a perfect being to not keep his intentions entirely hidden from us. Such an obligation, however, does not attach to a gifted chess player or physicist – Kasparov cannot be expected to reveal his game plan, while a physics professor cannot be expected to make her mathematical demonstration in support of quantum theory comprehensible to a high school physics student.

Similarly with Alston’s second set of analogies, where our inability to map the territory within which to look for x is taken to preclude us from inferring from our inability to find x that there is no x. This may be applicable to cases like the isolated tribesman’s search for life outside his forest or our search for extraterrestrial life, for in such scenarios there is no prior expectation that the objects of our search are of such a nature that, if they exist, they would make themselves manifest to us. However, in our search for God’s reasons we are toiling in a unique territory, one inhabited by a perfectly loving being who, as such, would be expected to make at least his presence, if not also his reasons for permitting evil, (more) transparent to us. This difference in prior expectations uncovers an important disanalogy between the cases Alston considers and cases involving our attempt to discern God’s intentions. Alston’s analogies, therefore, not only fail to advance the case against RNA but also suggest a line of thought in support of RNA. (For further discussion on RNA and divine hiddenness, see Trakakis (2003); see also Howard-Snyder & Moser (2002).)

4. Building a Theodicy, or Casting Light on the Ways of God

Most critics of Rowe’s evidential argument have thought that the problem with the argument lies with its factual premise. But what, exactly, is wrong with this premise? According to one popular line of thought, the factual premise can be shown to be false by identifying goods that we know of that would justify God in permitting evil. To do this is to develop a theodicy.

a. What Is a Theodicy?

The primary aim of the project of theodicy may be characterized in John Milton’s celebrated words as the attempt to “justify the ways of God to men.” That is to say, a theodicy aims to vindicate the justice or goodness of God in the face of the evil found in the world, and this it attempts to do by offering a reasonable explanation as to why God allows evil to abound in his creation.

A theodicy may be thought of as a story told by the theist explaining why God permits evil. Such a story, however, must be plausible or reasonable in the sense that it conforms to all of the following:

  1. commonsensical views about the world (for example, that there exist other people, that there exists a mind-independent world, that much evil exists);
  2. widely accepted scientific and historical views (for example, evolutionary theory), and
  3. intuitively plausible moral principles (for example, generally, punishment should not be significantly disproportional to the offence committed).

Judged by these criteria, the story of the Fall (understood in a literalist fashion) could not be offered as a theodicy. For given the doubtful historicity of Adam and Eve, and given the problem of harmonizing the Fall with evolutionary theory, such an account of the origin of evil cannot reasonably held to be plausible. A similar point could be made about stories that attempt to explain evil as the work of Satan and his cohorts.

b. Distinguishing a "Theodicy" from a "Defence"

An important distinction is often made between a defence and a theodicy. A theodicy is intended to be a plausible or reasonable explanation as to why God permits evil. A defence, by contrast, is only intended as a possible explanation as to why God permits evil. A theodicy, moreover, is offered as a solution to the evidential problem of evil, whereas a defence is offered as a solution to the logical problem of evil. Here is an example of a defence, which may clarify this distinction:

It will be recalled that, according to Mackie, it is logically impossible for the following two propositions to be jointly true:

  1. God is omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good,
  2. Evil exists.

Now, consider the following proposition:

  1. Every person goes wrong in every possible world.

In other words, every free person created by God would misuse their free will on at least one occasion, no matter which world (or what circumstances) they were placed in. This may be highly implausible, or even downright false – but it is, at least, logically possible. And if (3) is possible, then so is the following proposition:

  1. It was not within God’s power to create a world containing moral good but no moral evil.

In other words, it is possible that any world created by God that contains some moral good will also contain some moral evil. Therefore, it is possible for both (1) and (2) to be jointly true, at least when (2) is said to refer to "moral evil." But what about "natural evil"? Well, consider the following proposition:

  1. All so-called "natural evil" is brought about by the devious activities of Satan and his cohorts.

In other words, what we call "natural evil" is actually "moral evil" since it results from the misuse of someone’s free will (in this case, the free will of some evil demon). Again, this may be highly implausible, or even downright false – but it is, at least, possibly true.

In sum, Mackie was wrong to think that it is logically impossible for both (1) and (2) to be true. For if you conjoin (4) and (5) to (1) and (2), it becomes clear that it is possible that any world created by God would have some evil in it. (This, of course, is the famous free will defence put forward in Plantinga 1974: ch.9). Notice that the central claims of this defence – namely, (3), (4), and (5) – are only held to be possibly true. That’s what makes this a defence. One could not get away with this in a theodicy, for a theodicy must be more than merely possibly true.

c. Sketch of a Theodicy

What kind of theodicy, then, can be developed in response to Rowe’s evidential argument? Are there any goods we know of that would justify God in permitting evils like E1 and E2? Here I will outline a proposal consisting of three themes that have figured prominently in the recent literature on the project of theodicy.

(1) Soul-making. Inspired by the thought of the early Church Father, Irenaeus of Lyon (c.130-c.202 CE), John Hick has put forward in a number of writings, but above all in his 1966 classic Evil and the God of Love, a theodicy that appeals to the good of soul-making (see also Hick 1968, 1977, 1981, 1990). According to Hick, the divine intention in relation to humankind is to bring forth perfect finite personal beings by means of a "vale of soul-making" in which humans may transcend their natural self-centredness by freely developing the most desirable qualities of moral character and entering into a personal relationship with their Maker. Any world, however, that makes possible such personal growth cannot be a hedonistic paradise whose inhabitants experience a maximum of pleasure and a minimum of pain. Rather, an environment that is able to produce the finest characteristics of human personality – particularly the capacity to love – must be one in which “there are obstacles to be overcome, tasks to be performed, goals to be achieved, setbacks to be endured, problems to be solved, dangers to be met” (Hick 1966: 362). A soul-making environment must, in other words, share a good deal in common with our world, for only a world containing great dangers and risks, as well as the genuine possibility of failure and tragedy, can provide opportunities for the development of virtue and character. A necessary condition, however, for this developmental process to take place is that humanity be situated at an "epistemic distance" from God. On Hick’s view, in other words, if we were initially created in the direct presence of God we could not freely come to love and worship God. So as to preserve our freedom in relation to God, the world must be created religiously ambiguous or must appear, to some extent at least, as if there were no God. And evil, of course, plays an important role in creating the desired epistemic distance.

(2) Free will. The appeal to human freedom, in one guise or another, constitutes an enduring theme in the history of theodicy. Typically, the kind of freedom that is invoked by the theodicist is the libertarian sort, according to which I am free with respect to a particular action at time t only if the action is not determined by all that happened or obtained before t and all the causal laws there are in such a way that the conjunction of the two (the past and the laws) logically entails that I perform the action in question. My mowing the lawn, for instance, constitutes a voluntary action only if, the state of the universe (including my beliefs and desires) and laws of nature being just as they were immediately preceding my decision to mow the lawn, I could have chosen or acted otherwise than I in fact did. In this sense, the acts I perform freely are genuinely "up to me" – they are not determined by anything external to my will, whether these be causal laws or even God. And so it is not open to God to cause or determine just what actions I will perform, for if he does so those actions could not be free. Freedom and determinism are incompatible.

The theodicist, however, is not so much interested in libertarian freedom as in libertarian freedom of the morally relevant kind, where this consists of the freedom to choose between good and evil courses of action. The theodicist’s freedom, moreover, is intended to be morally significant, not only providing one with the capacity to bring about good and evil, but also making possible a range of actions that vary enormously in moral worth, from great and noble deeds to horrific evils.

Armed therefore with such a conception of freedom, the free will theodicist proceeds to explain the existence of moral evil as a consequence of the misuse of our freedom. This, however, means that responsibility for the existence of moral evil lies with us, not with God. Of course, God is responsible for creating the conditions under which moral evil could come into existence. But it was not inevitable that human beings, if placed in those conditions, would go wrong. It was not necessary, in other words, that humans would misuse their free will, although this always was a possibility and hence a risk inherent in God’s creation of free creatures. The free will theodicist adds, however, that the value of free will (and the goods it makes possible) is so great as to outweigh the risk that it may be misused in various ways.

(3) Heavenly bliss. Theodicists sometimes draw on the notion of a heavenly afterlife to show that evil, particularly horrendous evil, only finds its ultimate justification or redemption in the life to come. Accounts of heaven, even within the Christian tradition, vary widely. But one common feature in these accounts that is relevant to the theodicist’s task is the experience of complete felicity for eternity brought about by intimate and loving communion with God. This good, as we saw, plays an important role in Hick’s theodicy, and it also finds a central place in Marilyn Adams’ account of horrendous evil.

Adams (1986: 262-63, 1999: 162-63) notes that, on the Christian world-view, the direct experience of "face-to-face" intimacy with God is not only the highest good we can aspire to enjoy, but is also an incommensurable good – more precisely, it is incommensurable with respect to any merely temporal evils or goods. As the apostle Paul put it, “our present sufferings are not worth comparing with the glory that will be revealed in us” (Rom 8:18, NIV; compare 2 Cor 4:17). This glorification to be experienced in heaven, according to Adams, vindicates God’s justice and love toward his creatures. For the experience of the beatific vision outweighs any evil, even evil of the horrendous variety, that someone may suffer, thus ensuring a balance of good over evil in the sufferer’s life that is overwhelmingly favourable. But as Adams points out, “strictly speaking, there will be no balance to be struck” (1986: 263, emphasis hers), since the good of the vision of God is incommensurable with respect to one’s participation in any temporal or created evils. And so an everlasting, post-mortem beatific vision of God would provide anyone who experienced it with good reason for considering their life – in spite of any horrors it may have contained – as a great good, thus removing any grounds of complaint against God.

Bringing these three themes together, a theodicy can be developed with the aim of explaining and justifying God’s permission of evil, even evil of the horrendous variety. To illustrate how this may be done, I will concentrate on Rowe’s E2 and the Holocaust, two clear instances of horrendous moral evil.

Notice that these two evils clearly involve a serious misuse of free will on behalf of the perpetrators. We could, therefore, begin by postulating God’s endowment of humans with morally significant free will as the first good that is served by these evils. That is to say, God could not prevent the terrible suffering and death endured by Sue and the millions of Holocaust victims while at the same time creating us without morally significant freedom – the freedom to do both great evil and great good. In addition, these evils may provide an opportunity for soul-making – in many cases, however, the potential for soul-making would not extend to the victim but only to those who cause or witness the suffering. The phenomenon of "jailhouse conversions," for example, testifies to the fact that even horrendous evil may occasion the moral transformation of the perpetrator. Finally, to adequately compensate the victims of these evils we may introduce the doctrine of heaven. Postmortem, the victims are ushered into a relation of beatific intimacy with God, an incommensurable good that "redeems" their past participation in horrors. For the beatific vision in the afterlife not only restores value and meaning to the victim’s life, but also provides them with the opportunity to endorse their life (taken as a whole) as worthwhile.

Does this theodicy succeed in exonerating God? Various objections could, of course, be raised against such a theodicy. One could, for example, question the intelligibility or empirical adequacy of the underlying libertarian notion of free will (see, for example, Pereboom 2001: 38-88). Or one might follow Tooley (1980:373-75) and Rowe (1996: 279-81, 2001a: 135-36) in thinking that, just as we have a duty to curtail another person’s exercise of free will when we know that they will use their free will to inflict considerable suffering on an innocent (or undeserving) person, so too does God have a duty of this sort. On this view, a perfectly good God would have intervened to prevent us from misusing our freedom to the extent that moral evil, particularly moral evil of the horrific kind, would either not occur at all or occur on a much more infrequent basis. Finally, how can the above theodicy be extended to account for natural evil? Various proposals have been offered here, the most prominent of which are: Hick’s view that natural evil plays an essential part in the "soul-making" process; Swinburne’s "free will theodicy for natural evil" – the idea, roughly put, is that free will cannot be had without the knowledge of how to bring about evil (or prevent its occurrence), and since this knowledge of how to cause evil can only be had through prior experience with natural evil, it follows that the existence of natural evil is a logically necessary condition for the exercise of free will (see Swinburne 1978, 1987: 149-67, 1991: 202-214, 1998: 176-92); and "natural law theodicies," such as that developed by Reichenbach (1976, 1982: 101-118), according to which the natural evils that befall humans and animals are the unavoidable by-products of the outworking of the natural laws governing God’s creation.

5. Further Responses to the Evidential Problem of Evil

Let’s suppose that Rowe’s evidential argument from evil succeeds in providing strong evidence in support of the claim that there does not exist an omnipotent, omniscient, wholly good being. What follows from this? In particular, would a theist who finds its impossible to fault Rowe’s argument be obliged to give up her theism? Not necessarily, for at least two further options would be available to such a theist.

Firstly, the theist may agree that Rowe’s argument provides some evidence against theism, but she may go on to argue that there is independent evidence in support of theism which outweighs the evidence against theism. In fact, if the theist thinks that the evidence in support of theism is quite strong, she may employ what Rowe (1979: 339) calls "the G.E. Moore shift" (compare Moore 1953: ch.6). This involves turning the opponent’s argument on its head, so that one begins by denying the very conclusion of the opponent’s argument. The theist’s counter-argument would then proceed as follows:

(not-3) There exists an omnipotent, omniscient, wholly good being.
(2) An omniscient, wholly good being would prevent the occurrence of any intense suffering it could, unless it could not do so without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse.
(not-1) (Therefore) It is not the case that there exist instances of horrendous evil which an omnipotent, omniscient being could have prevented without thereby losing some greater good or permitting some evil equally bad or worse.

Although this strategy has been welcomed by many theists as an appropriate way of responding to evidential arguments from evil (for example, Mavrodes 1970: 95-97, Evans 1982: 138-39, Davis 1987: 86-87, Basinger 1996: 100-103) – indeed, it is considered by Rowe to be “the theist’s best response” (1979: 339) – it is deeply problematic in a way that is often overlooked. The G.E. Moore shift, when employed by the theist, will be effective only if the grounds for accepting not-(3) [the existence of the theistic God] are more compelling than the grounds for accepting not-(1) [the existence of gratuitous evil]. The problem here is that the kind of evidence that is typically invoked by theists in order to substantiate the existence of God – for example, the cosmological and design arguments, appeals to religious experience – does not even aim to establish the existence of a perfectly good being, or else, if it does have such an aim, it faces formidable difficulties in fulfilling it. But if this is so, then the theist may well be unable to offer any evidence at all in support of not-(3), or at least any evidence of a sufficiently strong or cogent nature in support of not-(3). The G.E. Moore shift, therefore, is not as straightforward a strategy as it initially seems.

Secondly, the theist who accepts Rowe’s argument may claim that Rowe has only shown that one particular version of theism – rather than every version of theism – needs to be rejected. A process theist, for example, may agree with Rowe that there is no omnipotent being, but would add that God, properly understood, is not omnipotent, or that God’s power is not as unlimited as is usually thought (see, for example, Griffin 1976, 1991). An even more radical approach would be to posit a "dark side" in God and thus deny that God is perfectly good. Theists who adopt this approach (for example, Blumenthal 1993, Roth 2001) would also have no qualms with the conclusion of Rowe’s argument.

There are at least two problems with this second strategy. Firstly, Rowe’s argument is only concerned with the God of orthodox theism as described in Section 1.a above, not the God of some other version of theism. And so objections drawn from non-orthodox forms of theism fail to engage with Rowe’s argument (although such objections may be useful in getting us to reconsider the traditional understanding of God). A second problem concerns the worship-worthiness of the sort of deity being proposed. For example, would someone who is not wholly good and capable of evil be fit to be the object of our worship, total devotion and unconditional commitment? Similarly, why place complete trust in a God who is not all-powerful and hence not in full control of the world? (To be sure, even orthodox theists will place limits on God’s power, and such limits on divine power may go some way towards explaining the presence of evil in the world. But if God’s power, or lack thereof, is offered as the solution to the problem of evil – so that the reason why God allows evil is because he doesn’t have the power to prevent it from coming into being – then we are faced with a highly impotent God who, insofar as he is aware of the limitations in his power, may be considered reckless for proceeding with creation.)

6. Conclusion

Evidential arguments from evil, such as those developed by William Rowe, purport to show that, grounds for belief in God aside, the existence of evil renders atheism more reasonable than theism. What verdict, then, can be reached regarding such arguments? A brief answer to this question may be provided by way of an overview of the foregoing investigation.

Firstly, as was argued in Section II, the "open theist" response to Rowe’s theological premise either runs the risk of diminishing confidence in God or else is entirely compatible with the theological premise. Secondly, the "sceptical theist" objection to Rowe’s inference from inscrutable evil to pointless evil was examined in Section III and was found to be inadequately supported. Thirdly, various theodical options were canvassed in Section IV as a possible way of refuting Rowe’s factual premise, and it was found that a theodicy that appeals to the goods of free will, soul-making, and a heavenly afterlife may go some way in accounting for the existence of moral evil. Such a theodicy, however, raises many further questions relating to the existence of natural evil and the existence of so much horrendous moral evil. And finally, as argued in Section V, the strategy of resorting to the "G.E. Moore shift" faces the daunting task of furnishing evidence in support of the existence of a perfect being; while resorting to a non-orthodox conception of God dissolves the problem of evil at the cost of corroding religiously significant attitudes and practices such as the love and worship of God.

On the basis of these results it can be seen that Rowe’s argument has a strongly resilient character, successfully withstanding many of the objections raised against it. Much more, of course, can be said both in support of and against Rowe’s case for atheism. Although it might therefore be premature to declare any one side to the debate victorious, it can be concluded that, at the very least, Rowe’s evidential argument is not as easy to refute as is often presumed.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord. 1996. “Redemptive Suffering: A Christian Solution to the Problem of Evil,” in Robert Audi and William J. Wainwright (eds), Rationality, Religious Belief, and Moral Commitment. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, pp.248-67.
  • Adams, Marilyn McCord. 1999. Horrendous Evils and the Goodness of God. Melbourne: Melbourne University Press.
  • Alston, William P. 1991. “The Inductive Argument from Evil and the Human Cognitive Condition,” Philosophical Perspectives 5: 29-67.
  • Alston, William P. 1996. “Some (Temporarily) Final Thoughts on the Evidential Arguments from Evil,” in Daniel Howard-Snyder (ed.), The Evidential Argument from Evil. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, pp.311-32.
  • Ascol, Thomas K. 2001. “Pastoral Implications of Open Theism,” in Douglas Wilson (ed.), Bound Only Once: The Failure of Open Theism. Moscow, ID: Canon Press, pp.173-90.
  • Basinger, David. 1996. The Case for Freewill Theism: A Philosophical Assessment. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Blumenthal, David R. 1993. Facing the Abusing God: A Theology of Protest. Louisville, KY: Westminster John Knox Press.
  • Boyd, Gregory A. 2000. God of the Possible: A Biblical Introduction to the Open View of God. Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Books.
  • Boyd, Gregory A. 2003. Is God to Blame? Moving Beyond Pat Answers to the Problem of Evil. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Brown, Patterson. 1967. “God and the Good,” Religious Studies 2: 269-76.
  • Christlieb, Terry. 1992. “Which Theisms Face an Evidential Problem of Evil?” Faith and Philosophy 9: 45-64.
  • Chrzan, Keith. 1994. “Necessary Gratuitous Evil: An Oxymoron Revisited,” Faith and Philosophy 11: 134-37.
  • Davis, Stephen T. 1987. “What Good Are Theistic Proofs?” in Louis P. Pojman (ed.), Philosophy of Religion: An Anthology. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, pp.80-88.
  • Draper, Paul. 1989. “Pain and Pleasure: An Evidential Problem for Theists,” Nous 23: 331-50.
  • Evans, C. Stephen. 1982. Philosophy of Religion: Thinking about Faith. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Griffin, David Ray. 1976. God, Power, and Evil: A Process Theodicy. Philadelphia, PA: Westminster Press.
  • Griffin, David Ray. 1991. Evil Revisited: Responses and Reconsiderations. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Hasker, William. 2004. Providence, Evil and the Openness of God. London: Routledge.
  • Hick, John. 1966. Evil and the God of Love, first edition. London: Macmillan.
  • Hick, John. 1968. “God, Evil and Mystery,” Religious Studies 3: 539-46.
  • Hick, John. 1977. Evil and the God of Love, second edition. New York: HarperCollins.
  • Hick, John. 1981. “An Irenaean Theodicy” and “Response to Critiques,” in Stephen T. Davis (ed.), Encountering Evil: Live Options in Theodicy, first edition. Edinburgh: T & T Clark, pp.39-52, 63-68.
  • Hick, John. 1990. Philosophy of Religion, fourth edition. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
  • Hoffman, Joshua, and Gary S. Rosenkrantz. 2002. The Divine Attributes. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel, and Frances Howard-Snyder. 1999. “Is Theism Compatible with Gratuitous Evil?” American Philosophical Quarterly 36: 115-29.
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel, and Paul K. Moser (eds). 2002. Divine Hiddenness: New Essays. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Jordan, Jeff. 2001. “Blocking Rowe’s New Evidential Argument from Evil,” Religious Studies 37: 435-49.
  • Mackie, J.L. 1955. “Evil and Omnipotence,” Mind 64: 200-212.
  • Mavrodes, George I. 1970. Belief in God: A Study in the Epistemology of Religion. New York: Random House.
  • McCloskey, H.J. 1960. “God and Evil,” Philosophical Quarterly 10: 97-114.
  • McNaughton, David. 1994. “The Problem of Evil: A Deontological Perspective,” in Alan G. Padgett (ed.), Reason and the Christian Religion: Essays in Honour of Richard Swinburne. Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp.329-51.
  • Moore, G.E. 1953. Some Main Problems of Philosophy. London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • Morris, Thomas V. 1987. Anselmian Explorations: Essays in Philosophical Theology. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Morris, Thomas V. 1991. Our Idea of God: An Introduction to Philosophical Theology. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Nelson, Mark T. 1991. “Naturalistic Ethics and the Argument from Evil,” Faith and Philosophy 8: 368-79.
  • O’Connor, David. 1998. God and Inscrutable Evil: In Defense of Theism and Atheism. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Otte, Richard. 2002. “Rowe’s Probabilistic Argument from Evil,” Faith and Philosophy 19: 147-71.
  • Pereboom, Derk. 2001. Living Without Free Will. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Peterson, Michael L. 1982. Evil and the Christian God. Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Book House.
  • Peterson, Michael L. 1998. God and Evil: An Introduction to the Issues. Boulder, CO: Westview Press.
  • Pinnock, Clark H., Richard Rice, John Sanders, William Hasker, and David Basinger. 1994. The Openness of God: A Biblical Challenge to the Traditional Understanding of God. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1974. The Nature of Necessity. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1977. God, Freedom, and Evil. Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.
  • Quinn, Philip L., and Charles Taliaferro (eds). 1997. A Companion to Philosophy of Religion. Cambridge, MA: Blackwell.
  • Reichenbach, Bruce R. 1976. “Natural Evils and Natural Law: A Theodicy for Natural Evils,” International Philosophical Quarterly 16: 179-96.
  • Reichenbach, Bruce R. 1982. Evil and a Good God. New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Reitan, Eric. 2000. “Does the Argument from Evil Assume a Consequentialist Morality?” Faith and Philosophy 17: 306-19.
  • Rogers, Katherin A. 2000. Perfect Being Theology. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Roth, John K. 2001. “A Theodicy of Protest”, in Stephen T. Davis (ed.), Encountering Evil: Live Options in Theodicy, second edition. Louisville, KY: Westminster John Knox Press, pp.1-20.
  • Rowe, William L. 1978. Philosophy of Religion: An Introduction, first edition. Encino, CA: Dickenson Publishing Company..
  • Rowe, William L. 1979. “The Problem of Evil and Some Varieties of Atheism,” American Philosophical Quarterly 16: 335-41.
  • Rowe, William L. 1986. “The Empirical Argument from Evil,” in Audi and Wainwright (eds), Rationality, Religious Belief, and Moral Commitment, pp.227-47.
  • Rowe, William L. 1988. “Evil and Theodicy,” Philosophical Topics 16: 119-32.
  • Rowe, William L. 1991. “Ruminations about Evil,” Philosophical Perspectives 5: 69-88.
  • Rowe, William L. 1995. “William Alston on the Problem of Evil,” in Thomas D. Senor (ed.), The Rationality of Belief and the Plurality of Faith: Essays in Honor of William P. Alston. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, pp.71-93.
  • Rowe, William L. 1996. “The Evidential Argument from Evil: A Second Look,” in Daniel Howard-Snyder (ed.), The Evidential Argument from Evil, pp.262-85.
  • Rowe, William L. 2001a. “Grounds for Belief Aside, Does Evil Make Atheism More Reasonable than Theism” in William Rowe (ed.), God and the Problem of Evil. Malden, MA: Blackwell, pp.124-37.
  • Rowe, William L. 2001b. “Reply to Howard-Snyder and Bergmann,” in Rowe (ed.), God and the Problem of Evil, pp.155-58.
  • Russell, Bruce. 1989. “The Persistent Problem of Evil,” Faith and Philosophy 6: 121-39.
  • Russell, Bruce. 1996. “Defenseless,” in Daniel Howard-Snyder (ed.), The Evidential Argument from Evil, pp.193-205.
  • Sanders, John. 1998. The God Who Risks: A Theology of Providence. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Sennett, James F. 1993. “The Inscrutable Evil Defense Against the Inductive Argument from Evil,” Faith and Philosophy 10: 220-29.
  • Stump, Eleonore. 1997. “Review of Peter van Inwagen, God, Knowledge, and Mystery,” Philosophical Review 106: 464-67.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1977. The Coherence of Theism. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1978. “Natural Evil,” American Philosophical Quarterly 15: 295-301.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1987. “Knowledge from Experience, and the Problem of Evil,” in William J. Abraham and Steven W. Holtzer (eds), The Rationality of Religious Belief: Essays in Honour of Basil Mitchell. Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp.141-67.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1991. The Existence of God, revised edition. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1998. Providence and the Problem of Evil. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Tooley, Michael. 1980. “Alvin Plantinga and the Argument from Evil,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 58: 360-76.
  • Trakakis, Nick. 2003. “What No Eye Has Seen: The Skeptical Theist Response to Rowe’s Evidential Argument from Evil,” Philo 6: 263-79.
  • Van Inwagen, Peter. 1988. “The Place of Chance in a World Sustained by God,” in Thomas V. Morris (ed.), Divine and Human Action. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, pp.211-35.
  • Ware, Bruce. 2000. God’s Lesser Glory: The Diminished God of Open Theism. Wheaton, IL: Crossways Books.
  • Wykstra, Stephen J. 1984. “The Humean Obstacle to Evidential Arguments from Suffering: On Avoiding the Evils of 'Appearance',” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 16: 73-93.
  • Wykstra, Stephen J. 1986. “Rowe’s Noseeum Arguments from Evil,” in Daniel Howard-Snyder (ed.), The Evidential Argument from Evil, pp.126-50.

Author Information

Nick Trakakis
Australian Catholic University


An apology is the act of declaring one’s regret, remorse, or sorrow for having insulted, failed, injured, harmed or wronged another. Some apologies are interpersonal (between individuals, that is, between friends, family members, colleagues, lovers, neighbours, or strangers). Other apologies are collective (by one group to another group or by a group to an individual). More generally, apologies can be offered “one to one,” “one to many,” “many to one,” or “many to many.”

While the practice of apologizing is nothing new, the end of the twentieth century and the beginning of the twenty-first witnessed a sharp rise in the number of public and political apologies, so much so that some scholars believe we are living in an “age of apology” (Gibney et al. 2006) or within a “culture of apology” (Mills 2001). A gesture formerly considered a sign of weakness has grown to represent moral strength and a crucial step towards potential reconciliation. Individuals, but more often states, churches, the judiciary, the medical profession and universities publicly issue apologies to those they have wronged in the past. Crimes ranging from personal betrayals and insults all the way to enslavement, violations of medical ethics, land displacement, violations of treaties or international law, systemic discrimination, wartime casualties, cultural disruptions, or political seizures constitute reasons for public expressions of regret.

What apologies are, and which goals they can promote, are objects of inquiry for a number of academic disciplines in the social sciences and humanities, including philosophy, political science, theology, psychology, history and sociology. Authors have been preoccupied by an array of questions: What are the validity conditions for an apology? Are these the same for interpersonal and collective apologies? And what purposes do apologies serve in human societies?

Table of Contents

  1. Interpersonal Apologies (“One to One”)
    1. Types
    2. Validity Conditions
    3. The Goals of the Interpersonal Apology
  2. The “One to Many” Apology
    1. Types
    2. Validity Conditions
    3. The Goals of the “One to Many” Apology
  3. Collective Apology (“Many to Many” or “Many to One”)
    1. Types
    2. Validity Conditions
    3. The Goals of the Collective Apology
    4. Scepticism about Collective Apologies
  4. Theatricality and Non-verbal Apologies
  5. Intercultural Apologies
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Interpersonal Apologies (“One to One”)

a. Types

In interpersonal apologies, an individual acknowledges and promises to redress offences committed against another individual. Such an apology can be performed in private (for instance, when one family member apologizes to another within the walls of their common abode) or in public (when individuals with public profiles apologise to their spouses, friends or colleagues for their blunders in a highly mediated fashion). Although, in a broad sense, everything is political, interpersonal apologies can be political in the stricter sense when the offender and the offended are politicians, public officials or representatives of political organizations. Clear examples of interpersonal political apologies are Senator Fred Thompson’s apology to Bill Clinton for insinuating that the latter had been involved in corruption or the apology by Republican House Majority Leader Dick Armey for referring to Representative Barney Frank, a Democrat representing Massachusetts, as “Barney Fag.”

b. Validity Conditions

In order to count as valid, an apology must meet a number of conditions. While there is great variation among authors on the number and exact role that different elements play within an apology, there is a growing consensus that an authentic apology implies: an acknowledgement that the incident in question did in fact occur and that it was inappropriate; a recognition of responsibility for the act; the expression of an attitude of regret and a feeling of remorse; and the declaration of an intention to refrain from similar acts in the future.

Authors dealing with the interpersonal apology position themselves on a continuum, ranging from rather lax to very stringent requirements that an apology must meet in order to be valid. Nick Smith provides us with the theoretically most systematic and normatively strictest account of the interpersonal apology, listing no less than twelve conditions for what he calls a valid “categorical” apology: a corroborated factual record, the acceptance of blame (to be distinguished from expressions of sympathy as in “I am sorry for your loss”), having standing (only those causally responsible for the offence can apologise), identification of each harm separately, identification of the moral principles underlying each harm, endorsement of the moral principles underlying each harm, recognition of the victim as a moral interlocutor, categorical regret (recognition of the fact that one’s act constitute a moral failure), the performance of the apology, reform and redress (post-apology), sincere intentions (lying when apologizing would only double the insult to the victim), and some expression of emotion (sorrow, guilt, empathy, sympathy) (Smith 2008). To the extent that an interpersonal apology fails on any of these criteria, it fails to achieve the status of a proper apology.

Whether one has a more lax or a more strict understanding of the validity conditions for the interpersonal apology, the offended individual has the standing to accept or reject the apology.

c. The Goals of the Interpersonal Apology

Normatively, interpersonal apologies are meant to recognise the equal moral worth of the victim. While the offence cannot be undone, the act of acknowledging it recognises the offended as an equal moral agent. Psychologically, an apology aims to meet the victim’s psychological needs of recognition, thus restoring her self-respect (Lazare 2004). Diminishing her desire for revenge, healing humiliations, and facilitating reconciliation are hoped for, but empirically contingent, effects of the apology. A cathartic effect on the guilty conscience of the offender is one other psychologically desirable consequence of a successful apology.

If the apology is accepted and if the offender is forgiven, the moral status quo ante (of equal moral worth of the offending and the offended parties) will be restored. However, forgiveness follows the apology only when the victim undergoes a deep psychological change: when she gives up her moral anger and the desire for revenge. Forgiveness should not be confused with forgetting, which is involuntary and does not presuppose a “change of heart.” While possible, forgiveness is neither necessary nor a right that the offender can claim once she has apologized and shown remorse. Forgiveness remains the privilege of the offended. In addition and contrary to some religious traditions, philosophers have usually argued that forgiveness should not be understood as the victim’s duty, nor should it be conceived of as a test of her good character.

2. The “One to Many” Apology

a. Types

The “one to many” apology can be either private or public, and can be political or non-political. For example, when one individual apologizes privately to her family, group of friends, neighbours, or colleagues for an insult or any other moral failure, we are talking about a non-political “one to many” apology. Public figures sometimes choose to communicate their regret via mass media, and then the apology is public and non-political. For example, actress Morgan James apologized to the cast and crew of the Sondheim musical “Into the Woods” for disproportionally criticising the New York production using language that was too strong. On the contrary, when a politician or official apologizes to her party, her voters or the nation for a wrong, we are dealing with a political public “one to many” apology. Kaing Guek Eav’s (a.k.a. “Duch”) apologizing to the Cambodian people for his actions in the S21 prison or Richard Nixon apologizing to his supporters and voters for the Watergate scandal are just two among many examples of “one to many” public political apologies.

b. Validity Conditions

When an individual apologizes to her family, to her group of friends, or to the nation, we apply the same standards of validity that we apply to interpersonal apologies. Minimally, an apology by one to the many must include an acknowledgement that a wrong has been committed, acceptance of responsibility, a promise of forbearance, expression of regret or remorse and an offer of repair. She who has committed the wrong has the proper standing to apologize.

Things get complicated when we consider who accepts the apology. The size of the group is an important variable. A family or a group of friends can come together and decide what to do in response to the apology. A corporation or a village can organize a consultative process and determine how to react. In fact, under the banner of “restorative justice”, an entire literature addresses the ways in which communities can heal broken relations and re-integrate those among their members who have gone astray (Braithwaite 1989). But how do large, unorganized groups, such as nations, accept an apology? Many critics of restorative justice have pointed out that such a conception of justice does not make much sense outside small, closely knit communities. Can there ever be consensus about how to deal with officials’ expressions of regret within the large, pluralistic publics of today’s societies? Elections and opinion polls are probably the only – imperfect – mechanisms for gaining insight into whether an apology has or has not been accepted by the members of the polity. While a great deal of attention has been paid to the normative pre-requisites of a valid apology, there are no systematic studies regarding their effect on the public culture of the societies in which they are offered. This is an important lacuna in great need of remedy.

c. The Goals of the “One to Many” Apology

The purposes of the non-political “one to many” apology overlap with those of the interpersonal acts of contrition: recognizing the victims as moral interlocutors and communicating the fact that the offender understands and regrets the violation of their legitimate moral expectations, thus making a first step towards a desired reconciliation.

Beside the acknowledgement and recognition functions of the political variety of the “one to many” apology, such acts also seek to satisfy the publicity requirement and set the record straight, re-affirm the principles the community abides by and, in giving an account of one’s personal failures as a politician or representative, they individualize guilt. Strategically, such acts may be employed to minimize political losses, save one’s political career and, if that were not possible, to insulate one’s office or party from the negative consequences of a particular person’s misdeeds. It may also be used to increase the chances of a pardon in case the misdeeds are of a criminal nature.

3. Collective Apology (“Many to Many” or “Many to One”)

a. Types

Collective apologies take two forms: by “many to many” or by “many to one”. In the case of “many to many” one group apologizes to another group. For instance, the French railway company SNCF apologized for transporting Jews to the extermination camps during the Nazi occupation and the Vatican apologized to women for the violations of their rights and historical denigration at the hands of the Catholic Church. In the case of “many to one” a group apologizes to an individual. Clear examples are the apology by the Canadian government to Maher Arar for the ordeal he suffered as a result of his rendition to Syria or corporate apologies to individual clients for faulty services or goods.

When looking into collective apologies, the state has received most of the scholarly attention as perpetrator and apologizer. In addressing the issue of state apologies, we can speak of three contexts where such acts are considered appropriate: domestic, international and postcolonial. In the domestic realm, political apologies address injustice committed against citizens under the aegis of the state. Canada’s apology and compensation to Canadians of Chinese origin for the infamous “Chinese Head Tax” law and the United State’s apology and compensation for American citizens of Japanese descent for their internment during World War II are relevant examples. In the international realm, political apologies are important diplomatic tools and usually address injustice committed during wartime, but not only. In this category, we could discuss Japan’s “sorry” for the abuse of Korean and Chinese “comfort women” and Belgium’s expression of regret for not having intervened to prevent the genocide in Rwanda. Finally, one can identify postimperial and postcolonial relations as a context, somewhere between the domestic and the international realm. Australia’s and Canada’s apologies to their Aboriginal communities for forced assimilation policies, Queen Elizabeth’s declaration of sorrow for Britain’s treatment of New Zealand’s Maori communities, and Guatemala’s apology to a victimized Mayan community constitute important illustrations.

b. Validity Conditions

When applied to collective apologies for harms and wrongs featuring multiple perpetrators – oftentimes committed a long time ago – many of Smith’s criteria for a categorical “sorry” do not hold. Consequently, those who measure collective apologies against the standards for interpersonal apologies argue against the very idea of collective apologies, and especially against the idea of collective apologies for injustices that took place in the distant past.

First, adequately isolating each and every offence inflicted upon the victim(s) can be a daunting task when dealing with multiple perpetrators. Secondly, what do we mean by collective responsibility? In what way can we plausibly speak of collective – as opposed to individual – acts? Third, who has the proper standing to apologize for something that the collective has supposedly perpetrated: the upper echelons of the chain of command or the direct perpetrators? What about those members of the group who had not been involved in the violations? Fourth, can groups express remorse and regret? How can we measure their sincerity and commitment to transformation and redress in the absence of these emotions? Fifth, things are further complicated because often there is no consensus behind a collective’s decision to apologize.

Most of the time, some members of the community reject the idea of apologizing for a past wrong. They see public contrition as a threat to the self-image of the group and as an unnecessary tainting of its history. All recent examples of collective apologies have turned out to be controversial and antagonizing, so much so that some scholars have argued that the lack of consensus constitutes an insuperable obstacle to collective apologies. Last but not least, who should accept these collective apologies? The answer appears to be clear in the case of a “many to one” apology. But what about a “many to many” scenario? The direct victims? What about their families? And what if the members of the group that the apology addresses cannot agree on whether to accept the apology or not?

All these problems are amplified when the direct perpetrators and victims no longer exist. In such cases, there is no identity between perpetrator and apologiser or between the victim and the addressee of the apology. What is more, the potential apologizers and addressees of the apology often owe their very existence to the fact that the injustices had been committed in the past, as is the case, for example, of almost everyone in the Americas or Australia today: without the injustices committed against the First Nations and without the slave trade the demographics of the continents would look different in the 21st Century. For them to apologize sincerely, i.e. to express regret for the very events that made their existence possible, would be impossible.

One way of circumventing the identity problem is to argue that, even if they are not the direct victims, the descendants of victims suffer today the repercussions of the violations in the past. For instance, one might argue that African Americans experience today the socio-economic repercussions of a history of discrimination and oppression that goes back to the slave trade. Consequently, they are owed an apology. White Americans, on the contrary, have been the beneficiaries of the same violations, even if they are not the direct perpetrators thereof. As involuntary beneficiaries of violence they might express regret for the fact that they owe their existence to injustices committed by their ancestors.

Yet the problems do not stop here. Immigration adds to the complexity of the identity problem: should recent immigrants apologise given that they have not even benefitted from the past injustices and they do not owe their existence to the perpetrators of past injustices?

Another way of dealing with the question of the validity of collective apologies is to give up the interpersonal model and think of them as a rather distinct category, whose purposes and functions differ from those of interpersonal apologies. Thus, scholars have argued that it is normatively sound to ascribe responsibility to collectives or institutions as continuous in time and as transcending the particular individuals constituting them at a certain moment. In addition, collectives are responsible for reproducing the culture that made it possible for atrocities to go on uncontested. Therefore, collective responsibility requires that groups’ representatives acknowledge the fact that an injustice has been committed, mark discontinuity with the discriminatory practices of the past, and commit themselves to non-repetition and redress.

Collective responsibility must be conceptually distinguished from collective guilt, a philosophically more problematic notion. For example, a present government who has not committed any wrongs can still take responsibility by acknowledging that wrongs have been committed against a certain group or person in the past, that it was “our culture” that enabled the abuses, that the abuses have repercussions in the present, and that they will not be allowed to happen again. A pledge to revise the very foundations on which the relations between various groups are established within the polity and material compensations for the losses incurred by the victims give concreteness to the apology. In this sense, it can be safely said that collective apologies have both a symbolic function (recognition of the offended group as worthy of respect) and a utility function (the apology might bring about reparations to the victims and might lead to better inter-group relations).

If the issue of collective responsibility is addressed in this way, we then need to turn to the question of who has standing to apologize for the collective. Unlike interpersonal apologies—where the offender has to apologize to the offended—collective apologies depend on representation, or, in other words, they are done by proxy. If we understand collective apologies as symbolic acts and if we agree that collectives can take responsibility for past wrongs even if their current members did not commit any of the past offences, then a legitimate representative – perceived by the collective as having the authority to speak for the collective – has the standing to apologize.

Naturally, the affective dimension of the collective apology becomes less significant if we give up the interpersonal model. The representatives offering the apology might experience feelings of contrition, remorse and regret, but their emotional response is not a necessary condition of an authentic apology by collective agents such as churches, professions, or the state. While representatives speaking on behalf of the group or institution may experience such emotions, the sincerity of the act should not be measured in affective units. The “sincerity” of collective apologies should be measured in terms of what follows from the act. Changes in the norms and practices of the collective, reparations, compensation, or memorialization projects give concreteness to the symbolic act of apologizing.

Last but not least, to whom is the apology addressed? Theorists who do not take the interpersonal “sorry” as a template for the collective apology argue that they are addressed to a number of audiences. First, apologies are directed towards victims and their families and their descendants. Secondly, they are addressed to the general public, with a view to communicating that what happened in the past is in great tension with the moral principles the group subscribes to and that such abuses will not be tolerated ever again. Lastly, the international society – or more abstractly humanity as a whole – is the indirect audience of a collective apology.

c. The Goals of the Collective Apology

If we agree that we can speak meaningfully about public expressions of regret by institutions, then we will also think that they do not serve the same purposes as interpersonal apologies. Such acts aim to restore diplomatic relations, restore the dignity of insulted groups, extend the boundaries of the political community by including the formerly disenfranchised, re-establish equality among groups and recognize suffering, and stimulate reflection and change in a discriminatory public culture. They could also mark a (re-)affirmation of the fundamental moral principles of the community, promote national reconciliation, strengthen a principle of transnational cooperation and contribute to the improvement of international law and diplomatic relations, make a relationship possible by creating a less hostile environment for special groups, and mark a society’s affirmation of a set of virtues in contradistinction to a past of exclusion.

Theological approaches to the functions that collective apologies can perform add to the scholarly reflection about these political practices. In her path-breaking book on the religious dimensions of collective apologies, Celermajer uses insights from the Jewish and the Christian notions and institutions of repentance in order to support an account of collective apologies as speech acts through which “we as a community” ritually express shame for our past, appraise the impact of the past on the present and the future, and make a commitment to change who “we” are by bridging the gap between our ideals and our practices (Celermajer 2009). Other scholars have made reference to the Christian notion of covenant so as to theorise apologies as “embracing” acts and as mechanisms of possible reconciliation. Contributions by theologians thus illuminate one more normative source for the multi-faceted practice of apology: religious traditions.

d. Scepticism about Collective Apologies

While many scholars see public apologies as creating a space of communal reflection and restoration, there are strong sceptical positions that see such official acts as nothing but a “smoke screen” meant to hide the intention to avoid responsibility or further projects of assimilation and discrimination. On the basis of normative inconsistencies associated with current practices of apologies, realist scholars have objected that apologies are a form of “sentimental politics” that serves as a “seductive, feel-good strategy contrived and promoted by governments” to compensate for the lack of redistributive measures. On this view, apologies allow political elites to take the higher moral ground against those who came before them—unfairly applying current standards to the past, thus committing the sin of presentism – and to capitalize electorally.

Defenders of the value of collective apology respond that the presence of strategic reasons does not necessarily doom such practices to irrelevance. True, unless coupled with compensatory schemes and a renunciation of oppressive practices, such declarations of sorrow are signs of hypocritical and meaningless righteousness, far from appropriately addressing the atrocities for which they are issued. Compensation without an apology is also insufficient, as it cannot symbolically affirm the value of the victims. In addition, it might send the wrong signal - that of trying to “buy” the victim’s forgiveness, thus doubling the insult. To the extent that they live up to the tasks they set themselves, i.e. to the extent that they take concrete steps to address injustice symbolically and materially, apologies are “sincere”.

A different kind of criticism comes from conservative commentators who tend to be averse to the idea of apologizing for a past of state-sponsored violence. The fear that discussing the past might damage the community’s self-image pervades many democratic societies with a history of injustice. Turkey’s refusal to acknowledge the Armenian genocide and the US’s problematic relationship with its long history of racial discrimination are two notorious examples where a discomfort with the past prevents sincere processes of national reckoning.

In response to this line of critique, one can argue that democratic elites can employ two strategies: encourage everyone to participate in a political ritual of contrition and assume the unsavoury past or invite resistant groups to conceive of honesty about the past as an act of courage, not an injustice. A rhetorically powerful appeal to positive feelings of courage, rather than shame, to pride, rather than repentance, could persuade citizens to see the apology as a sign of strength, and not one of weakness.

4. Theatricality and Non-verbal Apologies

The theatrical or ritualistic dimension of the collective apology cannot be omitted from any comprehensive discussion of the practice. While public interpersonal apologies by celebrities can be analysed in terms of their theatrical aspects – just think of Arnold Schwarzenegger or Tiger Woods publicly apologizing to their spouses – it is usually collective political apologies that make a more interesting object for this type of inquiry.

Rhetoricians have pointed to the need for the apologizer to establish a special relation between herself and the audience. She should be able to give meaningful expression to common sentiment and avoid being perceived as out of touch with the public. Timing, the rhetorical register used, the tone, the educational and memorialization projects that precede the apology, and the theatrical props used should enter the consideration of those who want their apology to resonate with the wider public. Thinking of the apology in terms of theatre allows us to grasp not only the validity and power of the performance by the apologizer but also the choice that the spectator has to either accept or reject the authority of the apologizer.

While apologies have been mostly studied as verbal (oral or written) acts, some scholars have recently turned their attention to the non-verbal dimension of the practice. Willy Brandt’s kneeling in front of the monument dedicated to the Warsaw Ghetto uprising in 1970 or Pope John Paul II leaning against the Western Wall and slipping a piece of paper containing a prayer into its crevices have been interpreted as acts of apology, regret and sorrow for the suffering of the Jews at the hands of Nazi Germany and the Catholic Church, respectively. Looking into gestures, bodily posture, location and emotional expressions allows us to understand the complexity of factors that enter into an apology that resonates with its audiences, thus adding richness to any analysis of such practices.

5. Intercultural Apologies

The phenomenon of intercultural apologies – interpersonal and collective apologies between individuals with different cultural backgrounds – has been made the object of numerous empirical studies. Such studies usually compare “Western” (mostly American) and “Eastern” (mostly East-Asian) understandings of the apology.

While apologies do cut across cultures, sociologists, social psychologists and students of intercultural communication tell us that there is variation in the type and number of validity conditions, the nature of acts that should give occasion to an apology, the strength of the motivation to apologize, the kind of purposes that they are meant to serve, as well as in the form and style that the practice adopts. For instance, Western individuals and institutions are supposedly less willing to apologize, more likely to focus on the mens rea (the intention behind the offence) and on the justification of the offence, while Asian individuals and institutions are more willing to apologize unconditionally, more likely to zoom in on the consequences of the offence, and see it within its broader context.

Such variation might tempt the observer to essentialize cultures, reify the differences, and deny the possibility of meaningful apologies between members of different cultural groups. The more difficult – yet more productive – alternative is to resist the temptation of going down the path of incommensurability and to try and valorise the reconciliation potential such acts may bring about. A willingness to see the similarities beyond the differences, to adjust one’s expectations so as to accommodate the expectations of the other and to learn transculturally may pave the way to conflict resolution, be it between persons or collectives.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Andrieu, Kora. “‘Sorry for the Genocide’: How Public Apologies Can Help Promote National Reconciliation.” Millennium Journal of International Studies 38, no. 1 (2009): 3–23.
    • Uses Habermas’s notion of discursive solidarity to show how apologies can help rebuild political trust.
  • Barkan, Elazar and Alexander Karn. Taking Wrongs Seriously: Apologies and Reconciliation. Stanford CA: Stanford University Press, 2006.
    • It analyzes, in a comparative and interdisciplinary framework the role and function—as well as the limitations—that apology has in promoting dialogue, tolerance, and cooperation between groups confronting one another over past injustices.
  • Barnlund, D. & Yoshioka, M. “Apologies: Japanese and American styles.” International Journal of Intercultural Relations 14, (1990): 193-205.
    • A comparative contribution to the intercultural study of apologies, focusing on American and Japanese practices of apology.
  • Bilder, Richard B. "The Role of Apology in International Law and Diplomacy." Virginia Journal of International Law 46, no. 3 (2006): 437-473.
    • Written from the perspective of International Relations, with a focus on the diplomatic use of apologies.
  • Borneman, John. “Public Apologies as Performative Redress.” SAIS Review 25, no. 2, (2005): 59-60.
    • Explores the role of apologies in conflict resolution processes.
  • Braithwaite, John. Crime, Shame and Reintegration. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
    • Foundational text for restorative justice in criminal law.
  • Celermajer, Danielle. The Sins of the Nation and the Ritual of Apology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009.
    • Explores political apologies by mobilising religious tropes from Judaism and Christianity and speech-act theory.
  • Cunningham, Michael. “Saying Story: The Politics of Apology.” The Political Quarterly 70, no 3 (1999): 285-293.
    • One of the first and clearest articles to theorise the morphology of apologies.
  • De Gruchy, John W. Reconciliation: Restoring Justice. Minneapolis MN: Fortress, 2002.
    • An essentially theological account of processes of political reconciliation.
  • Engerman, Stanley L. "Apologies, Regrets, and Reparations." European Review 17, no. 3-4 (2009): 593-610.
    • A historical examination of the development of the practice of apologies in the last few decades.
  • Gibney, Mark, Rhoda Howard-Hassman, Jean-Marc Coicaud and Niklaus Steiner (eds.). The Age of Apology: The West Faces its Own Past, Tokyo: United Nations University Press, 2006.
    • Extensive collection of essays addressing the normative issues associated with the practice of collective apologies, with a focus on state apologies.
  • Gibney, Mark and Erik Roxtrom. "The Status of State Apologies." Human Rights Quarterly 23, no. 4 (2001): 911-939.
    • Analyses the importance of transnational apologies in the development of human rights standards.
  • Gill, Kathleen. "The Moral Functions of an Apology." The Philosophical Forum 31, no. 1 (2000): 11-27.
    • Analyses the moral aspects of apologizing, considering its impact on those who offer the apology, the recipient of the apology, and relevant communities.
  • Govier, Trudy, Taking Wrongs Seriously (Amherst: Humanity Books, 2006).
    • One of the most important contributions to philosophical reflections on political reconciliation and its challenges.
  • Govier, Trudy and Wilhelm Verwoerd. “The Promise and Pitfalls of Apology,” Journal of Social Philosophy, Vol. 33, no. 1, (Spring 2002), pp. 67 – 82.
    • Uses the South African experiment in truth and reconciliation to examine the pitfalls of apologies.
  • Griswold, Charles L. Forgiveness: A Philosophical Exploration. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
    • A philosophical exploration of what is involved in processes of forgiveness.
  • Horelt, Michel- André. “Performing Reconciliation: A Performance Approach to the Analysis of Political Apologies.” In Nicola Palmer, Danielle Granville and Phil Clark (eds.), Critical Perspectives on Transitional Justice (Cambridge: Intersentia, 2011):347-369.
    • One of the very few contributions exploring the role of non-verbal elements in apologies.
  • Howard-Hassmann, Rhoda. “Official Apologies”. Transitional Justice Review, Vol.1, Iss.1, (2012), 31-53.
    • Unpacks the various moral, sociological and political dimensions of collective apologies.
  • Kampf, Zohar. “Public (Non–)Apologies: The Discourse of Minimizing Responsibility.” Journal of Pragmatics 41 (2009): 2257–2270.
    • Analyses a number of apologies to highlight the strategies that officials adopt in trying to minimize their responsibility for the wrongs they are apologising for.
  • La Caze, Marguerite. “The Asymmetry between Apology and Forgiveness.” Contemporary Political Theory 5 (2006) 447–468.
    • Discusses the idea that apologizing does not trigger a duty of forgiveness for the addressee of the apology.
  • Lazare, Aaron. On Apology. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004.
    • A psychological account of the processes involved in giving and receiving an apology.
  • Mihai, Mihaela. “When the State Says ‘Sorry’: State Apologies as Exemplary Political Judgments,” Journal of Political Philosophy 21, no. 2 (2013): 200-220.
    • Looks at how collective apologies could mobilize public support from a reluctant public who oppose the idea of an apology for past injustice.
  • Mills, Nicolaus. “The New Culture of Apology.” Dissent 48, no. 4 (2001): 113-116.
    • Discusses the growing number of public apologies and the functions they are meant to perform.
  • Negash, Girma. Apologia Politica: States & their Apologies by Proxy. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2006.
    • Examines public apology as ethical and public discourse, recommends criteria for the apology process, analyzes historical and contemporary cases, and formulates a guide to ethical conduct in public apologies.
  • Nobles, Melissa. The Politics of Official Apologies. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2008.
    • A citizenship-based justification for the practice of collective apologies for past injustice.
  • Public Apology Database, published by the CCM Lab, the University of Waterloo.
    • A comprehensive, structured, data base of apologies.
  • Schmidt, Theron, ‘We Say Sorry’: Apology, the Law and Theatricality, Law Text Culture, 14(1), 2010, 55-78.
    • Explores the theatricality at work in three examples of publicly performed discourse.
  • Smith, Nick. I Was Wrong: The Meanings of Apologies. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008.
    • A philosophical account of the conditions of validity for interpersonal and collective apologies.
  • Sugimoto, N. “A Japan-U.S. comparison of apology styles.” Communication Research, 24 (1997): 349-370.
    • Important contribution for the intercultural study of apologies.
  • Tavuchis, Nicholas. Mea Culpa: A Sociology of Apology and Reconciliation. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1991.
    • A sociological take on apologies and one of the first books published on the topic.
  • Thaler, Mathias. “Just Pretending: Political Apologies for Historical Injustice and Vice’s Tribute to Virtue.” Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy 15, no. 3 (2012): 259–278.
    • Examines the sincerity condition of collective apologies and argues for a purely consequentialist view of such acts.
  • Thompson, Janna. “The Apology Paradox.” The Philosophical Quarterly 50, No. 201 (Oct., 2000): 470-475.
    • Examines the non-identity problem in apologies for historical injustices.
  • Villadsen, Kisa Storm. "Speaking on Behalf of Others: Rhetorical Agency and Epideictic Functions of Official Apologies." Rhetoric Society Quarterly 38, no. 9 (2008): 25-45.
    • Looks at apologies through the lens of rhetoric.

Author Information

Mihaela Mihai
University of York
United Kingdom

Philosophy through Film

This article introduces the main perspectives concerning philosophy through film. Film is understood not so much as an object of philosophical reflection but as a medium for engaging in philosophy. Contributions to the area have flourished since the beginning of the 21st century, along with debates over the extent to which film can really be understood to be “doing” philosophy, as opposed to merely serving as a source of illustration or example for philosophical reflection. A number of objections have their origins in perceived similarities between the cinema and Plato’s cave; other objections have their origins in more general Platonic criticisms of fictive art’s capacity to reveal truth. Against these objections are some surprisingly bold views of film’s capacity to do philosophy, to the effect that much of what can be done in the verbal medium can also be done in the cinematic one; or that there is a distinctive kind of cinematic thinking that resists paraphrasing in traditional philosophical terms. There are also more moderate views, to the effect that film can be seen as engaging in certain recognizably philosophical activities, such as the thought experiment; or that they are able to present certain kinds of philosophical material better than standard philosophical genres. This article considers these views for and against the idea of philosophy through film. It also considers the “imposition” objection—that while film may serve to provide useful illustration, any philosophizing is in fact being done by the philosopher using the film.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Philosophy through Film?
  2. Platonic Objections
    1. Cinema as Plato's Caves
    2. Wartenberg and Thought Experiments
  3. Objections: Smith, Russell
  4. Objecting to the ‘Bold Thesis’
    1. Livingston
    2. Mulhall
    3. Sinnerbrink
    4. Cox and Levine
  5. The Imposition Objection
  6. References and Further Reading

1. What is Philosophy through Film?

This article introduces the main perspectives concerning the idea of doing philosophy through film. By film here is meant, primarily, narrative fiction film. The idea of doing, or at least engaging in some way with, philosophy through film can mean at least two things. Firstly, it may mean using film as a resource, a source of example and illustration, in order to illuminate philosophical positions, ideas and questions. Secondly, it may mean that film itself is to be understood as a medium for philosophising—doing philosophy in film or philosophy as film. The latter implies a more robust engagement of film with philosophy. The extent to which a film can be philosophical or contribute to philosophical knowledge has itself been a matter of some debate. However, what is broadly accepted is that many films ‘resonate in fruitful ways with traditional and contemporary philosophical issues’ (Livingston and Plantinga 2009: xi).

Consideration of film in its philosophical significance, and of philosophical issues through film, can be distinguished from more traditional philosophy of film, though in practice the two activities overlap. Both are subfields in the area of philosophical aesthetics. Philosophy of film traditionally concerns itself with the reflective study of the nature of film, aiming to spell out what film is, whether it is an art, how it differs from other arts, and so on. It is philosophy about film. Contrasted with this is the idea of film serving as a resource, means or medium for the illumination and exploration of philosophical ideas and questions. This is philosophy through film. Historically, philosophy through film is of a more recent vintage than philosophy of film, which enjoyed significant development in the 1980s. Philosophy through film has flourished mostly since 2000, although there were a number of important forerunners who promoted the idea that film can contribute to philosophy, including Cavell (1979), Jarvie (1987), Kupfer (1999) and Freeland (2000).

Since the turn of the century a significant amount of literature has emerged, devoted to the exploration of philosophical themes and questions through narrative films or genres of narrative film. The literature in this area includes more or less popular explorations of the philosophical dimensions of particular films and genres, and of the work of specific directors or writers (for example, Irwin 2002, Abrams 2007, Sanders 2007, Eaton 2008, LaRocca 2011). Along with them there are more pedagogically-oriented introductions to philosophy through film (for example, Litch 2002, Rowlands 2004, Falzon 2007, Cox and Levine 2012). There are also the more theoretical discussions defending the idea of philosophy through film (for example, Mulhall 2002, Wartenberg 2007, Sinnerbrink 2011), or criticising it (for example, Russell 2000, Smith 2006, Livingston 2009).

This article will discuss a range of philosophical positions that have emerged both for and against the idea of philosophy through film. It will proceed by considering a number of objections to the idea.

2. Platonic Objections

The idea of philosophy through film most clearly contrasts with the view that film has nothing to do with philosophy; that film is in effect philosophy’s ‘bad other’, containing all that is foreign or dubious from philosophy’s point of view. Along these lines it might be argued that philosophy is the realm of reflection and debate, whereas film is restricted to experience and action; that philosophy is concerned with reality and truth, as opposed to film which is the realm of mere illusion, appearance, unreal images; or that philosophy deals with universal questions and is a serious business, whereas film is confined to particular narratives, and is designed only for entertainment and distraction. Implicit in the distinctions invoked here is a certain conception of philosophy. As might be expected, considering film to be outside the realm of the philosophical depends on having a certain view of what constitutes philosophy. In general, consideration of the question of philosophy through film inevitably raises meta-philosophical questions about the nature of philosophy itself.

a. Cinema as Plato's Caves

The dismissal of film as inherently non-philosophical is at the heart of what can be called the ‘Platonic’ objection to philosophy through film. Many of the oppositions invoked in distinguishing the philosophical from the non-philosophical - between reflection and experience, reality and illusion, universality and particularity - find articulation in Plato. They can be discerned in Plato’s Allegory of the Cave, in The Republic (514a–520a). The famous story of prisoners mistaking for reality what are in fact mere shadows projected on the cave wall carries the message that visual images and representations are inadequate as a source of knowledge; and more broadly, that philosophical enlightenment requires thinking and critical reflection, rather than reliance on the way things appear to us. There is also an implicit rejection, developed elsewhere by Plato, of the fictive arts, which trade in unreal representations and foster illusion.

Plato’s cave story has a particular resonance for film. The scenario proposed in the cave story is itself uncannily evocative of the modern cinema (within film theory, see for example Baudry 1976), and has been seen as haunting theoretical reflection on film (Stam 2009: 10). On this model, film is a realm of seductive illusion, all too readily confused with reality by the captive audience. This view is evident, amongst other places, in the Marxist or psychoanalytical semiotic theorising that was prominent in the 1960s and 1970s, which holds that narrative films are forms of bourgeois illusionism. Their apparently realistic content is in fact determined by the dominant ideology of the time, and they imprison their audience by inculcating conformist thinking that makes people accepting of their social and political circumstances (Wilson 1986: 12-13; Stam 2009: 138-9). Philosophical insight, it would appear, requires that one look elsewhere.

Against this view, which in its monolithic dismissal of film pays scant attention to what is going on in particular films themselves, is the contention that films can do more than simply echo dominant ideologies that distort and obscure social reality. Careful examination of individual films shows how prevailing ways of thinking, social practices and institutions, can not only be illuminated but also challenged within a cinematic framework, through playfulness, irony, even downright subversion (Wilson 1986: 13; Stam 2009: 139). For example, Ridley Scott’s feminist road movie Thelma and Louise, highlights and mocks various aspects of male power. This implies that film is capable of adopting some kind of reflective attitude towards what it presents, and that it can present narrative scenarios through which such reflective activity can be pursued. If this is so, Plato’s cave scenario is no longer an adequate model for film. Indeed, the very philosophical scenario that encourages one to think critically about what one experiences, to think philosophically, itself appears in various forms in film, with similar effects. For example, Bernardo Bertolucci’s film The Conformist (1970) uses Plato’s cave image to draw attention to the central character’s imprisonment in the delusions of Fascist ideology. As such, the critical reflection on what is given to us, arguably a necessary characteristic of philosophy, is not foreign to film.

b. Wartenberg and Thought Experiments

A second, though once again ultimately Platonic, objection to the idea of philosophy through film is that fiction film only deals in specific narratives, images, and scenarios, whereas philosophy concerns itself with universal truths. How can film, mired in the particular, have anything to do with philosophy? Thomas Wartenberg has developed a conception of philosophy through film that turns this objection on its head. He points out that fictional narratives can be found readily enough in philosophy itself, in the form of imaginary scenarios, hypothetical situations, in short, thought experiments. More than mere ornamentation, thought experiments play a role in arguments, initiating philosophical reflection, raising general questions, questioning existing views by posing counter-examples, exploring what is essential in a concept, confirming a theory or helping build one, and so forth. In other words they are modes of reflection, allowing general points to be made through particular stories (see Wartenberg 2007, 24, 56-65).

Plato’s cave story is itself such a thought experiment, a narrative embodying a memorable image or scenario, designed to raise general questions about the role of sense experience, the nature of knowledge, the character of philosophical enlightenment itself. Ironically enough, Plato resorts to a narrative, embodying a memorable image, in order to argue that images have no place in philosophical discourse; and indeed, he makes use of a narrative that helps to establish a larger narrative in which philosophy itself is seen as arising through the rejection of narrative in favour of a rational discourse devoted to universal truths (Wartenberg 2007: 21; see also Derrida 1993). As it happens, philosophical discourse is filled with such narrative thought experiments; from Plato’s Ring of Gyges to Descartes’ dream or evil demon hypotheses; from Locke’s prince and the cobbler; to Nozick’s experience machine. At the very least, one can say that concrete narratives and scenarios in the form of thought experiments are not foreign to philosophy; and equally, there is no reason why fiction film, which deals with such narratives, should not be able to pursue general points, or raise philosophical questions, through them. Wartenberg argues that it makes sense to think of some fiction films as working in ways that thought experiments do, and to the extent they may be seen as doing philosophy (Wartenberg 2007, 67). For example, Gondry’s 2004 film Eternal Sunshine of the Spotless Mind may be interpreted as a thought experiment that provides a counterexample to the ethical theory of utilitarianism (Wartenberg 2007, 76-93; see also Grau 2006).

It might be added that even within philosophical discourse, many of these experiments have a dramatic and decidedly cinematic quality about them; and film-makers have not been slow in translating them into visual form. For example, by appropriating skeptical thought experiments involving the possibility of global illusion - the cinematic appropriation of Descartes’ dream hypothesis or evil demon thought experiment in various forms, most famously in the Wachowski Brothers’ much discussed 1999 film The Matrix. The capacity of films to explicitly appropriate philosophical material also suggests a further, and comparatively straightforward way in which one might speak of philosophy through film: the film may be about philosophy in various ways. It may be about a philosopher who in the course of the film expounds their views, as in Derek Jarman’s Wittgenstein (1993); or it may have characters who articulate or discuss philosophical positions, such as Eric Rohmer’s Ma Nuit Chez Maud (1969) or Richard Linklater’s Waking Life (2001); or it may be an adaptation of a philosophically interesting text, as in Jean-Jacques Annaud’s The Name of the Rose (1986). However, this in itself only amounts to a recording of particular views and positions, which find expression in the film. It needs to be distinguished from the idea of film as a medium for philosophising, film as philosophy; and doing philosophy in film.

3. Objections: Smith, Russell

A third objection to the idea of philosophy through film can be found in Murray Smith, who argues that film may appropriate or employ philosophically interesting scenarios, but can never really engage with philosophy because it ultimately has very different structuring interests. Whereas philosophy presents thought experiments—narratives in which philosophical concerns, for example, epistemological issues, are at the forefront; in film it is artistic concerns—dramatic or comic ones—that dominate and trump any philosophical concerns (see Smith 2006). In this way film becomes once more the ‘bad other’ of philosophy. Against this it may be argued that it is artificial to acknowledge similarities between film and philosophical texts ‘only to insist that these similarities are subordinate to important differences between them’ (Wartenberg 2007: 16-17). In addition, it may of course be acknowledged that films do much more than simply engage with philosophical questions and concerns, but this does not in itself preclude the possibility that amongst other things, they might do precisely that.

Smith also supplements his argument by reinstating Plato’s denial of the capacity of fictive works to reveal truth. Smith claims that works of art like films are inherently ambiguous, and cannot present the sort of precision that is necessary for articulating and defending philosophical claims (Smith 2006; Wartenberg 2007: 17). A similar claim is made by Bruce Russell, for whom narrative films lack explicitness to the extent that it is not true that there is some particular argument to be found in them; they lack the explicitness necessary for philosophy (Russell 2000; Wartenberg 2007, 19). Against this it can be argued that philosophical claims and arguments attributed to films may not have always been formulated by philosophical interpreters as precisely as they should be, but ‘this does not establish the claim that the films themselves are inherently ambiguous and their arguments incapable of precise formulation’ (Wartenberg 2007: 20).

Here, once again, an a priori dismissal of the idea that film can be philosophical shows itself to be informed by Platonic considerations, in this case Plato’s dismissal of the artists from the city of philosophy. By the same token the notion of philosophy through film amounts to a repudiation of the Platonic prejudice against art, of the view, at least implicit in the cave scenario, that the fictive arts trade in unreal representations and foster illusion, and cannot be philosophically enlightening (see Wartenberg 2007:15,17; Sinnerbrink 2011: 4-5). Philosophy through film may not amount to an entirely anti-Platonic enterprise, however. As with Plato’s repudiation of image and narrative which he nonetheless makes use of in his own work, Plato’s dismissal of the artists is paradoxical, given that, as Iris Murdoch notes, Plato himself is a great artist (Murdoch 1977: 87).

4. Objecting to the ‘Bold Thesis’

a. Livingston

Paisley Livingston argues that film may certainly be used for philosophically interesting purposes, as a resource for philosophy. It can serve to illustrate views about scepticism, wisdom and so on, and even give expression to philosophically informed positions and perspectives. But to do more, to be able to be said to be philosophising, film would have to ‘make independent, innovative and significant contributions to philosophy by means unique to the cinematic medium…where such contributions are independent in the sense that they are inherent in the film, and not based on verbally articulated philosophising’ (Livingston 2008: 12). This is what Livingston calls the ‘bold thesis’ of film as philosophy, the view that films engage in creative philosophical thinking and the formation of new philosophical concepts. Livingston rejects this bold thesis, because either the philosophical content of a film can be paraphrased verbally, in which case it has no special connection with film, or it cannot be paraphrased, in which case one may wonder whether this supposed content exists at all.

b. Mulhall

Against this kind of view, a number of positions have been formulated to the effect that film is more than merely a resource for philosophy, a useful way of illustrating philosophical positions and themes. At one extreme, there is Stephen Mulhall’s classic formulation of film as philosophy, in the introduction to his book on the Alien films:

I do not look to these films as handy or popular illustrations of views and arguments properly developed by philosophers; I see them rather as themselves reflecting on and evaluating such views and arguments, as thinking seriously and systematically about them in just the same ways that philosophers do. Such films are not philosophy’s raw material, are not a source for its ornamentation; they are philosophical exercises, philosophy in action – film as philosophising (Mulhall 2002: 2).

This formulation implies that there can be a cinematic performance of philosophy—that what is done in the verbal medium of philosophy can also be done in the cinematic medium. However, by the same token it might be argued that on this view, everything done cinematically could also be done in purely verbal philosophical form; it could be entirely paraphrased, or re-expressed in verbal terms. The problem with this conception of philosophy through film is that film here may no longer be philosophy’s ‘bad other’, but in so far as it can be said to philosophize, it seems to have been effectively reduced to philosophy. On this conception, film as a philosophical exercise is too similar to philosophy to be doing anything distinctively cinematic; which also means that it presumably could be dispensed with in favour of purely verbal philosophical argument without any loss. The cinematic setting for this reflective activity is purely accidental. As such, philosophy through film simply turns out to be more philosophy.

c. Sinnerbrink

At the other extreme, Robert Sinnerbrink argues that films are able to engage in a distinctively cinematic kind of thinking that resists philosophical translation or paraphrase. Such films cannot be reduced to a philosophical thesis or theoretical problem, or translated into a ready-made position or argument; they confront existing categories and open up new ways of thinking (Sinnerbrink 2011:10). By concretely showing rather than arguing, these films question aspects of our practices or normative frameworks, challenge established ways of seeing, disclose new aspects of experience, and open up new paths of thinking (Sinnerbrink, 2011: 141, 142). Thus, for example, rather than exploring scenarios of global illusion that draw attention to a distinction between appearance and underlying reality, a film like David Lynch’s Mulholland Drive (2001) can be seen as bringing into question the very distinction between the real and the illusory, in order to explore an indeterminate zone between fantasy and reality (see Sinnerbrink 2005).

By the same token, however, it might be argued that the more distinctively cinematic the reflection, that is, the more it resists translation into a philosophical thesis or form, the less recognisably philosophical it is going to be. In other words, the less it will constitute philosophy through film. Whereas in Mulhall’s formulation, filmic reflection was too similar to philosophy to do anything distinctively cinematic; now filmic reflection is too different from philosophy to do anything recognisably philosophical. In a sense this view does not oppose Livingston’s rejection of the bold thesis regarding philosophy through film—not only because there cannot be a uniquely cinematic form of reflection, but because to the extent that there is, it is no longer philosophical. In this form, film would be philosophy’s ‘good other’. It would embody a form of thinking or of reflection—something other than philosophy. Film, so understood, would neither be a mere resource or instrument for philosophy, nor a form of reflection that could be translated into existing philosophical categories. Rather, it would be an autonomous mode of reflection that transcends philosophy. Here, one would be escaping from philosophy through film; though it might also be argued that this represents the transformation of philosophical reflection into something new.

d. Cox and Levine

Finally, a ‘moderate’ position, standing effectively between those of Mulhall and Sinnerbrink, which acknowledges both the philosophical and the necessarily cinematic character of cinematic thinking, is argued for by Damien Cox and Michael Levine. This is the view that films are capable of performing philosophical activities that can also be pursued in standard verbal philosophical form, but they can sometimes do some things better than written texts can. That is, precisely as films, they are capable of presenting certain kinds of philosophical material better than standard philosophical genres. This dovetails with the view developed by Wartenberg, discussed earlier, that film is able to explore philosophical issues and questions through concrete thought experiments. What Cox and Levine argue is that cinematic thought experiments can be presented with greater richness, nuance and perspective than may be found within the genres of professional philosophy (the book, the journal article), where these experiments are typically abstract, thin and context-free (Cox and Levine 201: 10-12).

This position joins with those critiques of philosophy to the effect that the peculiar abstractness of standard philosophical genres can be a source of distortion, and which argue that some areas of philosophy, like ethics, are sometimes more at home in literature and the arts (Cox and Levine 2012: 11-12; see Murdoch 1970, 1977; Nussbaum 1990). Clearly evident once again, in this affirmation of art in general and film in particular, is the rejection of the Platonic view that the fictive arts, trading in unreal representations only foster illusion, and have nothing to contribute to philosophy.

5. The Imposition Objection

The idea of philosophy through film, then, can cover a number of things, including: using film as a resource, providing useful examples and illustrations of philosophical ideas; and the idea of film as philosophizing, at least in the sense of evoking or enacting philosophically interesting thought experiments that remind us of various aspects of our concrete experience of life. In addition, it can cover the idea of film as being explicitly about philosophers or philosophy, giving explicit expression to philosophical positions and perspectives.

This brings us to one more possible objection to the idea of philosophy through film, in particular film as doing philosophy, namely, what has been termed by Wartenberg the imposition objection. This is the claim that film may certainly be used for philosophically interesting purposes, such as providing useful illustrations, but that any philosophizing is done by the philosopher using the film, rather than by the film itself. On this view, to think that the film itself is doing anything philosophical is a mistake; any philosophical significance one imagines to be discernible in the film itself is in fact only a projection of the philosopher’s views onto the film. A film may raise interesting questions, but only a philosophical interpreter can organize those into a coherent position or argument (Wartenberg 2007: 25). This view in effect requires that film be once again viewed as the ‘bad other’ of philosophy, with any philosophical significance necessarily being imposed from outside. At best, we are back with the view that film may serve as a useful resource for philosophy, a source of example and illustration, but that it cannot be said in any way to do philosophy.

Obviously, to the extent that film can be said to do philosophy, the imposition view has to be rejected. A general point to make here is that any engagement with film requires interpretation on the part of the onlooker, who is, after all, at the most basic level, required to organise and make sense of a multiplicity of images in a certain way. Engagement with film in its philosophical aspects is no different; it requires a certain reading or interpretation of the film on the part of the onlooker. At the very least, engaging with the philosophical dimension of a film involves singling out a particular aspect of that film and ignoring others, since there is always much more going on in a film than a concern with philosophically relevant matters. As far as responding to the imposition objection is concerned, the important issue is not whether there is interpretation but whether or not the interpretation, the philosophical reading, is imposed on the film; that is, whether it is appropriate or inappropriate to the film. With regard to what renders an interpretation appropriate, both author and audience -centred positions have been argued for in the literature. These alternatives recall broader debates in aesthetics and literary theory over how far a work of art is to be judged by reference to the purposes of its creator, and to what extent a text may yield more than the creator of the work could have conceived.

On the one hand there is the ‘author-centred’ view argued for by Wartenberg, that a philosophical interpretation of a film may be considered appropriate because it is grounded in the intentions of the authors of the film (Wartenberg 2007: 26). That is, it is necessary that the film’s creators intend to present the views or pose the questions that are being attributed to the film. As a result there are constraints as to what interpretations may be made. Specifically, one should never attribute to the film a meaning that could not be intended by the creator of that work. For a philosophical film interpretation to be plausible, it needs to posit a meaning the filmmaker at least could have intended. To that extent, the meaning discerned is not simply imposed or projected onto the film, but rather is inherent in the film, as part of its creators’ intention. Certainly, the filmmaker may not necessarily have an explicit conception of the philosophical views that are embedded in the film; but it is enough that they have some conception of the relevant idea, and what might be questionable about it. (Wartenberg 2007: 26, 91). A problem with the ‘author-centred’ view is that it may be difficult or impossible to establish what the director’s or writer’s intention might have been; and moreover, since films are collaborative endeavours it may not be possible even to identify a particular author.

On the other hand, there is the view that the philosophical views and questions presented in films can be assessed independently of authorial intention. For Cox and Levine, ‘[A]n interesting aspect of film, like other forms of narrative art (such as novels) is that it often lets us see and surmise a great deal more than its creators intended’ (Cox and Levine 2012: 13). In this spirit they argue that philosophical views may be embedded in a film without it being the director’s or writer’s intention that the view be manifest, or without them even being aware that it is a view they hold. That is, ‘it is often possible to distinguish authorial intention from what is revealed in film narrative, visual effect, or performance.’ (Cox and Levine 2012: 14-15) Here, the emphasis changes from a concern with the author’s intentions to how the film is received—an audience-centred interpretation. Films have ‘lives and meanings of their own,’ and these will vary over time and are relative to a degree to particular audiences (Cox and Levine 2012: 15).

What these views have in common is that they acknowledge that engagement with a film involves some interpretation on the part of the onlooker; but also that this interpretation is not arbitrary, such that one could read any kind of significance whatsoever into the film. That would indeed imply that any philosophical significance is simply being imposed on the film from outside. However, even an audience-centred interpretation is subject to constraints arising from the film itself. Not any kind of interpretation is appropriate; some interpretations work better than others. This is so even if one views the film merely as providing a handy illustration of a pre-existing philosophical position or issue, where the film is being used as a resource for philosophical purposes, and the concern is primarily to illuminate certain philosophical ideas. Even here the interpretation is not arbitrary. There are better or worse cinematic illustrations that one can appeal to; More or less effective cinematic resources one can make use of. Some films lend themselves more readily to the task than others; and to the extent that they do so, being able to make use of the film in this way is also saying something about the film itself, and reflects the reality of the film itself in so far as it engages with philosophical ideas. For example, one sees philosophical ideas like Locke’s memory-based conception of personal identity concretely illustrated in a film like Paul Verhoeven’s Total Recall (1990); the film also invites this interpretation, and thereby reveals itself to have strong philosophical resonances.

Furthermore, if film even as illustration can be said to be engaging with philosophy, it seems to follow that a sharp distinction cannot really be drawn between film as illustration for philosophy, and as doing philosophy. It would instead be a matter of degrees of engagement, of film being more or less engaged with philosophical positions, issues and questions. By the same token, if film does indeed have a capacity to do philosophy, in particular by presenting certain philosophical material with greater richness, nuance and perspective than is possible within the genres of professional philosophy, we would expect something of this to also be present in film as mere illustration. Certainly, Wartenberg has argued to this effect, that films which illustrate previously articulated philosophical positions can, despite their status as illustrations, deepen understanding of those positions by providing a concrete version of an abstract theory, and to that extent they can be said to embody philosophical thinking. For example, Charlie Chaplin’s Modern Times (1936) can be seen as offering a concrete illustration of Marx’s conception of the alienating mechanisation of human beings under the factory system, a concrete representation of an abstract account that clarifies and extends it, and shows its human significance (Wartenberg 2007: 32, 44-54).

Finally, if film even as illustration engages with philosophy, and there is no sharp distinction between film as illustration, and film as doing philosophy; it will no longer be possible to accept the former while rejecting the latter. The imposition objection allows that film may be used for illustration, but rejects the idea of film as philosophising, dismissing this as no more than a projection on the part of the onlooker. However, without a sharp distinction between the two, it is not possible to accept the former while rejecting the latter. Or to put it in more positive terms, accepting the former implicates one in the latter because far from being mere illustration, film as illustration can already be said, to an extent, to be doing philosophy.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Abrams, Jerold J. 2007. The Philosophy of Stanley Kubrick. Lexington: The University Press of Kentucky.
  • Baudry, Jean-Louis. 1976. ‘The Apparatus’, Camera Obscura. Fall 1976 1(11), 104-12.
  • Cavell, Stanley. 1979. The World Viewed: Reflections on the Ontology of Film, enlarged edition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Cox, Damien and Michael P. Levine. 2012. Thinking Through Film: Doing Philosophy, Watching Movies. Malden, Wiley-Blackwell
  • Derrida, Jacques. 1993. ‘Circumfession’, In J. Derrida & G. Bennington, Jacques Derrida (pp. 3–315). Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • Eaton, A.W. (ed.) 2008. Talk to Her, London/New York, Routledge.
  • Falzon, Christopher. 2007. Philosophy Goes to the Movies: an Introduction to Philosophy. London/New York, Routledge.
  • Freeland, Cynthia. 2000. The Naked and the Undead: Evil and the Appeal of Horror, Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Grau, Christopher. 2006. ‘Eternal Sunshine of the Spotless Mind and the Morality of Memory’, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 64 (1):119–133.
  • Irwin, William (ed.) 2002. The Matrix and Philosophy: Welcome to the Desert of the Real. Chicago: Open Court.
  • Jarvie, Ian. 1987. Philosophy of the Film: Epistemology, Ontology, Aesthetics. New York/London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Kupfer, Joseph H. 1999. Visions of Virtue in Popular Film. Boulder: Westview Press.
  • LaRocca, David (ed.) 2011. The Philosophy of Charlie Kaufman. Lexington: The University Press of Kentucky.
  • Litch, Mary. 2002. Philosophy through Film. New York: Routledge
  • Livingston, Paisley. 2006. ‘Theses on Cinema as Philosophy’, in Murray Smith and Thomas E. Wartenberg. 2006. Thinking Through Cinema: Film as Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Livingston, Paisley and Carl Plantinga (eds) 2009. ‘Preface’ to The Routledge Companion to Philosophy and Film. London/New York, Routledge.
  • Mulhall, Stephen. 2002. On Film. London: Routledge.
  • Murdoch, Iris. 1970. The Sovereignty of Good. Boston: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Murdoch, Iris. 1977. The Fire and the Sun: Why Plato Banished the Artists. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Nussbaum, Martha. 1990. Love’s Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press
  • Read, Rupert and Jerry Goodenough (eds) 2005. Film as Philosophy: Essays on Cinema after Wittgenstein and Cavell. London: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Rowland, Mark. 2004. The Philosopher at the End of the Universe. New York: Thomas Dunne Books .
  • Russell, Bruce. 2000. ‘The Philosophical Limits of Film’, Film and Philosophy. Special Issue on Woody Allen, 163-67.
  • Sanders, Steven M. 2007. The Philosophy of Science Fiction Film. Lexington: The University Press of Kentucky.
  • Sinnerbrink, Robert. 2005. ‘Cinematic Ideas: David Lynch's Mulholland Drive’, Film-Philosophy 9 (34).
  • Sinnerbrink, Robert. 2011. New Philosophies of Film: Thinking Images. London and New York: Continuum.
  • Smith, Murray ‘Film Art, Argument and Ambiguity’. 2006, in Murray Smith and Thomas E. Wartenberg (eds). 2006. Thinking Through Cinema: Film as Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Stam, Robert. 2000. Film Theory: An Introduction. Malden: Blackwell.
  • Wartenberg, Thomas. 2007. Thinking on Screen: Film as Philosophy. New York/London, Routledge.
  • Wilson, George. 1986. Narration in Light: Studies in Cinematic Point of View. Baltimore/London: The Johns Hopkins University Press.

Author Information

Christopher Falzon
University of Newcastle

Aesthetic Formalism

artistic imageFormalism in aesthetics has traditionally been taken to refer to the view in the philosophy of art that the properties in virtue of which an artwork is an artwork—and in virtue of which its value is determined—are formal in the sense of being accessible by direct sensation (typically sight or hearing) alone.

While such Formalist intuitions have a long history, prominent anti-Formalist arguments towards the end of the twentieth century (for example, from Arthur Danto and Kendall Walton according to which none of the aesthetic properties of a work of art are purely formal) have been taken by many to be decisive. Yet in the early twenty-first century there has been a renewed interest in and defense of Formalism. Contemporary discussion has revealed both “extreme” and more “moderate” positions, but the most notable departure from traditional accounts is the move from Artistic to Aesthetic Formalism.

One might more accurately summarize contemporary Formalist thinking by noting the complaint that prominent anti-Formalist arguments fail to accommodate an important aspect of our aesthetic lives, namely those judgements and experiences (in relation to art, but also beyond the art-world) which should legitimately be referred to as “aesthetic” but which are accessible by direct sensation, and proceed independently of one’s knowledge or appreciation of a thing’s function, history, or context.

The presentation below is divided into five parts. Part 1 outlines an historical overview. It considers some prominent antecedents to Formalist thinking in the nineteenth century, reviews twentieth century reception (including the anti-Formalist arguments that emerged in the latter part of this period), before closing with a brief outline of the main components of the twenty-first century Formalist revival. Part 2 returns to the early part of the twentieth century for a more in-depth exploration of one influential characterisation and defense of Artistic Formalism developed by art-critic Clive Bell in his book Art (1913). Critical reception of Bell’s Formalism has been largely unsympathetic, and some of the more prominent concerns with this view will be discussed here before turning—in Part 3—to the Moderate Aesthetic Formalism developed in the early part of the twenty-first century by Nick Zangwill in his The Metaphysics of Beauty (2001). Part 4 considers the application of Formalist thinking beyond the art world by considering Zangwill’s responses to anti-Formalist arguments regarding the aesthetic appreciation of nature. The presentation closes with a brief conclusion (Part 5) together with references and suggested further reading.

Table of Contents

  1. A Brief History of Formalism
    1. Nineteenth Century Antecedents
    2. Twentieth Century Reception
  2. Clive Bell’s Artistic Formalism
    1. Clive Bell and ‘Significant Form’
    2. The Pursuit of Lasting Values
    3. Aesthetic versus Non-Aesthetic Appreciation
    4. Conclusions: From Artistic to (Moderate) Aesthetic Formalism
  3. Nick Zangwill’s Moderate Aesthetic Formalism
    1. Extreme Formalism, Moderate Formalism, Anti-Formalism
    2. Responding to Kendall Walton’s Anti-Formalism
    3. Kant’s Formalism
  4. From Art to the Aesthetic Appreciation of Nature
    1. Anti-Formalism and Nature
    2. Formalism and Nature.
  5. Conclusions
  6. References and Further Reading

1. A Brief History of Formalism

a. Nineteenth Century Antecedents

When A. G. Baumgarten introduced the term “aesthetic” into the philosophy of art it seemed to be taken up with the aim of recognising, as well as unifying, certain practices, and perhaps even the concept of beauty itself. It is of note that the phrase l’art pour l’art seemed to gain significance at roughly the same time that the term aesthetic came into wider use.

Much has been done in recognition of the emergence and consolidation of the l’art pour l’art movement which, as well as denoting a self-conscious rebellion against Victorian moralism, has been variously associated with bohemianism and Romanticism and characterises a contention that, for some, encapsulates a central position on art for the main part of the nineteenth century. First appearing in Benjamin Constant’s Journal intime as early as 1804 under a description of Schiller’s aesthetics, the initial statement: “L’art pour l’art without purpose, for all purpose perverts art” has been taken not only as a synonym for the disinterestedness reminiscent of Immanuel Kant’s aesthetic but as a modus operandi in its own right for a particular evaluative framework and corresponding practice of those wishing to produce and insomuch define the boundaries of artistic procedure.

These two interpretations are related insofar as it is suggested that the emergence of this consolidated school of thought takes its initial airings from a superficial misreading of Kant’s Critique of Judgement (a connection we will return to in Part 3). Kant’s Critique was not translated into French until 1846, long after a number of allusions that implicate an understanding and certainly a derivation from Kant’s work. John Wilcox (1953) describes how early proponents, such as Victor Cousin, spoke and wrote vicariously of Kant’s work or espoused positions whose Kantian credentials can be—somewhat undeservedly it turns out—implicated. The result was that anyone interested in the arts in the early part of the nineteenth century would be exposed to a new aesthetic doctrine whose currency involved variations on terms including aesthetic, disinterest, free, beauty, form and sublime.

By the 1830s, a new school of aesthetics thus accessed the diluted Kantian notions of artistic genius giving form to the formless, presented in Scheller’s aesthetics, via the notion of beauty as disinterested sensual pleasure, found in Cousin and his followers, towards an understanding of a disinterested emotion which constitutes the apprehension of beauty. All or any of which could be referred to by the expression L’art pour l’art; all of which became increasingly associated with the term aesthetic.

Notable adoption, and thus identification with what may legitimately be referred to as this “school of thought” included Victor Hugo, whose preface to Cromwell, in 1827, went on to constitute a manifesto for the French Romantic movement and certainly gave support to the intuitions at issue. Théophile Gautier, recognising a theme in Hugo, promoted a pure art-form less constrained by religious, social or political authority. In the preface to his Premières poesies (1832) he writes: "What [end] does this [book] serve? - it serves by being beautiful… In general as soon as something becomes useful it ceases to be beautiful". This conflict between social usefulness versus pure art also gained, on the side of the latter, an association with Walter Pater whose influence on the English Aesthetic movement blossomed during the 1880s where the adoption of sentimental archaism as the ideal of beauty was carried to extravagant lengths. Here associations were forged with the likes of Oscar Wilde and Arthur Symons, further securing (though not necessarily promoting) a connection with aestheticism in general. Such recognition would see the influence of l’art pour l’art stretch well beyond the second half of the nineteenth century.

As should be clear from this brief outline it is not at all easy, nor would it be appropriate, to suggest the emergence of a strictly unified school of thought. There are at least two strands that can be separated in what has been stated so far. At one extreme we can identify claims like the following from the preface of Wilde’s The Picture of Dorian Gray: “There is no such thing as a moral or an immoral book. Books are well written or badly written.” Here the emphasis is initially on the separation of the value of art from social or moral aims and values. The sentiment is clearly reminiscent of Gautier’s claim: “Only those things that are altogether useless can be truly beautiful; anything that is useful is ugly; for it is the expression of some need…”. Yet for Wilde, and many others, the claim was taken more specifically to legitimise the production and value of amoral, or at least morally controversial, works.

In a slightly different direction (although recognisably local to the above), one might cite James Whistler: Art should be independent of all claptrap—should stand alone […] and appeal to the artistic sense of eye or ear, without confounding this with emotions entirely foreign to it, in devotion, pity, love, patriotism and the like.

While the second half of this statement seems merely to echo the sentiments expressed by Wilde in the same year, there is, in the first half, recognition of the contention Whistler was later to voice with regard to his painting; one that expressed a focus, foremost, on the arrangement of line, form and colour in the work. Here we see an element of l’art pour l’art that anticipated the importance of formal features in the twentieth century, holding that artworks contain all the requisite value inherently—they do not need to borrow significance from biographical, historical, psychological or sociological sources. This line of thought was pursued, and can be identified, in Eduard Hanslick’s The Beautiful in Music (1891); Clive Bell’s Art (1913); and Roger Fry’s Vision and Design (1920). The ruminations of which are taken to have given justification to various art movements from abstract, non-representational art, through Dada, Surrealism, Cubism.

While marked here as two separable strands, a common contention can be seen to run through the above intuitions; one which embarks from, but preserves, something of the aesthetic concept of disinterestedness, which Kant expressed as purposiveness without purpose. L’art pour l’art can be seen to encapsulate a movement that swept through Paris and England in the form of the new Aesthetic (merging along the way with the Romantic Movement and bohemianism), but also the central doctrine that formed not only the movement itself, but a well-established tradition in the history of aesthetics. L’art pour l’art captures not just a movement but an aesthetic theory; one that was adopted and defended by both critics and artists as they shaped art history itself.

b. Twentieth Century Reception

Towards the end of the twentieth century Leonard Meyer (in Dutton, 1983) characterised the intuition that we should judge works of art on the basis of their intrinsic formal qualities alone as a “common contention” according to which the work of art is said to have its complete meaning “within itself”. On this view, cultural and stylistic history, and the genesis of the artwork itself do not enhance true understanding. Meyer even suggests that the separation of the aesthetic from religion, politics, science and so forth, was anticipated (although not clearly distinguished) in Greek thought. It has long been recognised that aesthetic behaviour is different from ordinary behaviour; however, Meyer goes on to argue that this distinction has been taken too far. Citing the Artistic Formalism associated with Clive Bell (see Part 2), he concludes that in actual practice we do not judge works of art in terms of their intrinsic formal qualities alone.

However, Artistic Formalism, or its close relatives, have met with serious (or potentially disabling) opposition of the kind found in Meyer. Gregory Currie (1989) and David Davies (2004) both illustrate a similar disparity between our actual critical and appreciative practices and what is (in the end) suggested to be merely some pre-theoretical intuition. Making such a point in his An Ontology of Art, Currie draws together a number of familiar and related aesthetic stances under the term “Aesthetic Empiricism”, according to which

[T]he boundaries of the aesthetic are set by the boundaries of vision, hearing or verbal understanding, depending on which art form is in question. (Currie, 1989, p.18)

Currie asserts that empiricism finds its natural expression in aesthetics in the view that a work—a painting, for instance—is a “sensory surface”. Such a view was, according to Currie, supposed by David Prall when he said that “Cotton will suffice aesthetically for snow, provided that at our distance from it it appears snowy”. It is the assumption we recover from Monroe Beardsley (1958) in the view that the limits of musical appreciation are the limits of what can be heard in a work. Currie also recognises a comparable commitment concerning literature in Wimsatt and Beardsley’s The Intentional Fallacy (1946).  We can add to Currie’s list Clive Bell’s claim that

To appreciate a work of art we need bring with us nothing from life, no knowledge of its ideas and affairs, no familiarity with its emotions… we need bring with us nothing but a sense of form and colour and a knowledge of three-dimensional space.

Alfred Lessing, in his “What is Wrong with Forgery?” (in Dutton, 1983), argues that on the assumption that an artwork is a “sensory surface” it does seem a natural extension to claim that what is aesthetically valuable in a painting is a function solely of how it looks. This “surface” terminology, again, relates back to Prall who characterised the aesthetic in terms of an exclusive interest in the “surface” of things, or the thing as seen, heard, felt, immediately experienced. It echoes Fry’s claim that aesthetic interest is constituted only by an awareness of “order and variety in the sensuous plane”. However, like Kendall Walton (1970) and Arthur Danto (1981) before him, Currie’s conclusion is that this common and influential view is nonetheless false.

Walton’s anti-formalism is presented in his essay “Categories of Art” in which he first argues that the aesthetic properties one perceives an artwork as having will depend on which category one perceives the work as belonging to (for example, objects protruding from a canvas seen under the category of “painting”—rather than under the category of “collage”—may appear contrary to expectation and thus surprising, disturbing, or incongruous). Secondly, Walton argues that the aesthetic properties an artwork actually has are those it is perceived as having when seen under the category to which it actually belongs. Determination of “correct” categories requires appeal to such things as artistic intentions, and as knowledge concerning these requires more than a sense of form, color, and knowledge of three-dimensional space, it follows that Artistic Formalism must be false (see Part 3 for a more in-depth discussion of Walton’s anti-formalist arguments).

Similarly, Danto’s examples—these include artworks such as Marcel Duchamp’s “Readymades”, Andy Warhol’s Brillo Boxes, and Danto’s hypothetical set of indiscernible red squares that constitute distinct artworks with distinct aesthetic properties (indeed, two of which are not artworks at all but “mere things”)are generally taken to provide insurmountable difficulties for traditional Artistic Formalism. Danto argues that, regarding most artworks, it is possible to imagine two objects that are formally or perceptually indistinguishable but differ in artistic value, or perhaps are not artworks at all.

Despite the prominence of these anti-formalist arguments, there has been some notable resistance from the Formalist camp. In 1983 Denis Dutton published a collection of articles on forgery and the philosophy of art under the title The Forger’s Art. Here, in an article written for the collection, Jack Meiland argues that the value of originality in art is not an aesthetic value. In criticism of the (above) position held by Leonard Meyer, who defends the value of originality in artworks, Meiland asks whether the original Rembrandt has greater aesthetic value than the copy? He refers to “the appearance theory of aesthetic value” according to which aesthetic value is independent of the non-visual properties of the work of art, such as its historical properties. On this view, Meiland argues, the copy, being visually indistinguishable from the original, is equal in aesthetic value. Indeed, he points to an arguable equivocation in the sense of the word “original” or “originality”. The originality of the work will be preserved in the copy—it is rather the level of creativity that may be surrendered. We might indeed take the latter to devalue the copied work, but Meiland argues that while originality is a feature of a work, creativity is a feature applicable to the artist or in this case a feature lacking in the copyist, it therefore cannot affect the aesthetic quality of the work. Thus we cannot infer from the lack of creativity on the part of the artist that the work itself lacks originality.

This distinction between “artistic” and “aesthetic” value marks the transition from Artistic to Aesthetic Formalism. Danto, for example, actually endorsed a version of the latter in maintaining that (while indistinguishable objects may differ in terms of their artistic value or art-status) in being perceptually indiscernible, two objects would be aesthetically indiscernible also. Hence, at its strongest formulation Aesthetic Formalism distinguishes aesthetic from non-aesthetic value whilst maintaining that the former is restricted to those values that can be detected merely by attending to what can be seen, heard, or immediately experienced. Values not discerned in this way may be important, but should not be thought of as (purely) “aesthetic” values.

Nick Zangwill (2001) has developed a more moderate Aesthetic Formalism, drawing on the Kantian distinction between free (formal) and dependent (non-formal) beauty. In relation to the value of art, Zangwill accepts that “extreme formalism (according to which all the aesthetic properties of a work of art are formal) is false. But so too are strongly anti-Formalist positions such as those attributable to Walton, Danto, and Currie (according to which none of the aesthetic properties of a work of art are purely formal). Whilst conceding that the restrictions imposed by Formalism on those features of an artwork available for consideration are insufficient to deliver some aesthetic judgements that are taken to be central to the discourse, Zangwill maintains that there is nonetheless an “important truth” in formalism. Many artworks have a mix of formal and non-formal aesthetic properties, and at least some artworks have only formal aesthetic properties. Moreover, this insight from the Aesthetic Formalisist is not restricted to the art world. Many non-art objects also have important formal aesthetic properties. Zangwill even goes so far as to endorse extreme Aesthetic Formalism about inorganic natural items (such as rocks and sunsets).

2. Clive Bell’s Artistic Formalism

In Part 1 we noted the translation of the L’art pour l’art stance onto pictorial art with reference to Whistler’s appeal to “the artistic sense of eye and ear”.  Many of the accounts referred to above focus on pictorial artworks and the specific response that can be elicited by these. Here in particular it might be thought that Bell’s Artistic Formalism offers a position that theoretically consolidates the attitudes described.

Formalism of this kind has received largely unsympathetic treatment for its estimation that perceptual experience of line and colour is uniquely and properly the domain of the aesthetic. Yet there is some intuitive plausibility to elements of the view Bell describes which have been preserved in subsequent attempts to re-invigorate an interest in the application of formalism to aesthetics (see Part 3). In this section we consider Bell’s initial formulation, identifying (along the way) those themes that re-emerge in contemporary discussion.

a. Clive Bell and ‘Significant Form’

The claim under consideration is that in pictorial art (if we may narrow the scope for the purposes of this discussion) a work’s value is a function of its beauty and beauty is to be found in the formal qualities and arrangement of paint on canvas. Nothing more is required to judge the value of a work. Here is Bell:

What quality is shared by all objects that provoke our aesthetic emotions? What quality is common to Sta. Sophia and the windows at Chartres, Mexican sculpture, a Persian bowl, Chinese carpets, Giotto’s frescoes at Padua, and the masterpieces of Poussin, Piero della Francesca, and Cezanne? Only one answer seems possible - significant form. In each, lines and colours combined in a particular way, certain forms and relations of forms, stir our aesthetic emotions. These relations and combinations of lines and colours, these aesthetically moving forms, I call "Significant Form"; and "Significant Form" is the one quality common to all works of visual art. (1913, p.5)

These lines have been taken to summarise Bell’s account, yet alone they explain very little. One requires a clear articulation of what “aesthetic emotions” are, and what it is to have them stirred. Also it seems crucial to note that for Bell we have no other means of recognising a work of art than our feeling for it. The subjectivity of such a claim is, for Bell, to be maintained in any system of aesthetics. Furthermore it is the exercise of bringing the viewer to feel the aesthetic emotion (combined with an attempt to account for the degree of aesthetic emotion experienced) that constitutes the function of criticism. “…[I]t is useless for a critic to tell me that something is a work of art; he must make me feel it for myself. This he can do only by making me see; he must get at my emotions through my eyes.” Without such an emotional attachment the subject will be in no position to legitimately attribute to the object the status of artwork.

Unlike the proponents of the previous century Bell is not so much claiming an ought (initially) but an is. Significant form must be the measure of artistic value as it is the only thing that all those works we have valued through the ages have in common. For Bell we have no other means of recognising a work of art than our feeling for it. If a work is unable to engage our feelings it fails, it is not art. If it engages our feelings, but feelings that are sociologically contingent (for example, certain moral sensibilities that might be diminished or lost over time), it is not engaging aesthetic sensibilities and, inasmuch, is not art. Thus if a work is unable to stir the viewer in this precise and uncontaminated way (in virtue of its formal qualities alone), it will be impossible to ascribe to the object the status of artwork.

We are, then, to understand that certain forms—lines, colours, in particular combinations—are de facto producers of some kind of aesthetic emotion. They are in this sense “significant” in a manner that other forms are not. Without exciting aesthetic rapture, although certain forms may interest us; amuse us; capture our attention, the object under scrutiny will not be a work of art. Bell tells us that art can transport us

[F]rom the world of man’s activity to a world of aesthetic exaltation. For a moment we are shut off from human interests; our anticipations and memories are arrested; we are lifted above the stream of life. The pure mathematician rapt in his studies knows a state of mind which I take to be similar if not identical.

Thus the significance in question is a significance unrelated to the significance of life. “In this [the aesthetic] world the emotions of life find no place. It is a world with emotions of its own.” Bell writes that before feeling an aesthetic emotion one perceives the rightness and necessity of the combination of form at issue, he even considers whether it is this, rather than the form itself, that provokes the emotion in question. Bell’s position appears to echo G. E. Moore’s intuitionism in the sense that one merely contemplates the object and recognises the significant form that constitutes its goodness.

But the spectator is not required to know anything more than that significant form is exhibited. Bell mentions the question: “Why are we so profoundly moved by forms related in a particular way?” yet dismisses the matter as extremely interesting but irrelevant to aesthetics. Bell’s view is that for “pure aesthetics” we need only consider our emotion and its object—we do not need to “pry behind the object into the state of mind of him who made it.” For pure aesthetics, then, it need only be agreed that certain forms do move us in certain ways, it being the business of an artist to arrange forms such that they so move us.

b. The Pursuit of Lasting Values

Central to Bell’s account was a contention that the response elicited in the apprehension of significant form is one incomparable with the emotional responses of the rest of experience. The world of human interests and emotions do, of course, temper a great deal of our interactions with valuable objects, these can be enjoyable and beneficial, but constitute impure appreciation. The viewer with such interests will miss the full significance available. He or she will not get the best that art can give. Bell is scathing of the mistaken significance that can be attributed to representational content, this too signifies impure appreciation. He suggests that those artists “too feeble to create forms that provoke more than a little aesthetic emotion will try to eke that little out by suggesting the emotions of life”. Such interests betray a propensity in artists and viewers to merely bring to art and take away nothing more than the ideas and associations of their own age or experience. Such prima facie significance is the significance of a defective sensibility. As it depends only on what one can bring to the object, nothing new is added to one’s life in its apprehension. For Bell, then, significant form is able to carry the viewer out of life and into ecstasy. The true artist is capable of feeling such emotion, which can be expressed only in form; it is this that the subject apprehends in the true artwork.

Much visual art is concerned with the physical world—whatever the emotion the artists express may be, it seemingly comes through the contemplation of the familiar. Bell is careful to state, therefore, that this concern for the physical world can be (or should be) nothing over and above a concern for the means to the inspired emotional state. Any other concerns, such as practical utility, are to be ignored by art. With this claim Bell meant to differentiate the use of artworks for documentary, educational, or historical purposes. Such attentions lead to a loss of the feeling of emotions that allow one to get to the thing in itself. These are interests that come between things and our emotional reaction to them. In this area Bell is dismissive of the practice of intellectually carving up our environment into practically identified individuations. Such a practice is superficial in requiring our contemplation only to the extent to which an object is to be utilised. It marks a habit of recognising the label and overlooking the thing, and is indicative of a visual shallowness that prohibits the majority of us from seeing “emotionally” and from grasping the significance of form.

Bell holds that the discerning viewer is concerned only with line and colour, their relations and qualities, the apprehension of which (in significant form) can allow the viewer an emotion more powerful, profound, and genuinely significant than can be afforded by any description of facts or ideas. Thus, for Bell:

Great art remains stable and unobscure because the feelings that it awakens are independent of time and place, because its kingdom is not of this world. To those who have and hold a sense of the significance of form what does it matter whether the forms that move them were created in Paris the day before yesterday or in Babylon fifty centuries ago. The forms of art are inexhaustible; but all lead by the same road of aesthetic emotion to the same world of aesthetic ecstasy. (1913, p.16)

What Bell seems to be pushing for is a significance that will not be contingent on peculiarities of one age or inclination, and it is certainly interesting to see what a pursuit of this characteristic can yield. However, it is unclear why one may only reach this kind of significance by looking to emotions that are (in some sense) out of this world. Some have criticised Bell on his insistence that aesthetic emotion could be a response wholly separate from the rest of a person’s emotional character. Thomas McLaughlin (1977) claims that there could not be a pure aesthetic emotion in Bell’s sense, arguing that the aesthetic responses of a spectator are influenced by her normal emotional patterns. On this view the spectator’s emotions, including moral reactions, are brought directly into play under the control of the artist’s technique. It is difficult to deny that the significance, provocativeness and interest in many works of art do indeed require the spectator to bring with them their worldly experiences and sensibilities. John Carey (2005) is equally condemning of Bell’s appeal to the peculiar emotion provided by works of art. He is particularly critical of Bell’s contention that the same emotion could be transmitted between discreet historical periods (or between artist and latter-day spectator). On the one hand, Bell could not possibly know he is experiencing the same emotion as the Chaldean four thousand years earlier, but more importantly to experience the same emotion one would have to share the same unconscious, to have undergone the same education, to have been shaped by the same emotional experiences.

It is important to note that such objections are not entirely decisive. Provocativeness in general and indeed any interests of this kind are presumably ephemeral qualities of a work. These are exactly the kinds of transitory evaluations that Bell was keen to sidestep in characterising true works and the properties of lasting value. The same can be said for all those qualities that are only found in a work in virtue of the spectator’s peculiar education and emotional experience. Bell does acknowledge such significances but doesn’t give to them the importance that he gives to formal significance. It is when we strip away the interests, educations, and the provocations of a particular age that we get to those works that exhibit lasting worth. Having said that, there is no discernible argument in support of the claim that the lasting worth Bell attempts to isolate should be taken to be more valuable, more (or genuinely) significant than the kinds of ephemeral values he dismisses. Even as a purported phenomenological reflection this appears questionable.

In discussion of much of the criticism Bell’s account has received it is important not to run together two distinct questions. On the one hand there is the question of whether or not there exists some emotion that is peculiar to the aesthetic; that is “otherworldly” in the sense that it is not to be confused with those responses that temper the rest of our lives. The affirmation of this is certainly implicated in Bell’s account and is rightly met with some consternation. But what is liable to become obscured is that the suggestion of such an inert aesthetic emotion was part of Bell’s solution to the more interesting question with which his earlier writing was concerned. This question concerns whether or not one might isolate a particular reaction to certain (aesthetic) objects that is sufficiently independent of time, place and enculturation that one might expect it to be exhibited in subjects irrespective of their historical and social circumstance.

One response to this question is indeed to posit an emotional response that is unlike all those responses that are taken to be changeable and contingent on time, culture and so forth. Looking at the changeable interests of the art-world over time, one might well see that an interest in representation or subject matter betrays the spectator’s allegiance to “the gross herd” (as Bell puts it) of some era. But it seems this response is unsatisfactory. As we have seen, McLaughlin and Carey are sceptical of the kind of inert emotion Bell stipulates. Bell’s response to such criticisms is to claim that those unable to accept the postulation are simply ignorant of the emotion he describes. While this is philosophically unsatisfactory the issue is potentially moot. Still, it might be thought that there are other ways in which one might characterise lasting value such as to capture the kind of quality Bell pursued whilst dismissing the more ephemeral significances that affect a particular time.

Regarding the second question, it is tempting to see something more worthwhile in Bell’s enterprise. There is at least some prima facie attraction to Bell’s response, for, assuming that one is trying to distinguish art from non-art, if one hopes to capture something stable and unobscure in drawing together all those things taken to be art, one might indeed look to formal properties of works and one will (presumably) only include those works from any time that do move us in the relevant respect. What is lacking in Bell’s account is some defense of the claim, firstly that those things that move Bell are the domain of true value, and secondly that we should be identifying something stable and unobscure. Why should we expect to identify objects of antiquity as valuable artworks on the basis of their stirring our modern dispositions (excepting the claim—Bell’s claim—that such dispositions are not modern at all but timeless)? Granted, there are some grounds for pursuing the kind of account Bell offers, particularly if one is interested in capturing those values that stand the test of time. However, Bell appears to motivate such a pursuit by making a qualitative claim that such values are in some way more significant, more valuable than those he rejects. And it is difficult to isolate any argument for such a claim.

c. Aesthetic versus Non-Aesthetic Appreciation

The central line of Bell’s account that appears difficult to accept is that while one might be able to isolate a specifically perceptual response to artworks, it seems that one could only equate this response with all that is valuable in art if one were able to qualify the centrality of this response to the exclusion of others. This presentation will not address (as some critics do) the question of whether such a purely aesthetic response can be identified; this must be addressed if anything close to Bell’s account is to be pursued. But for the time being all one need acknowledge is that the mere existence of this response is not enough to legitimise the work Bell expected it to do. A further argument is required to justify a thesis that puts formal features (or our responses to these) at centre stage.

Yet aside from this aim there are some valuable mechanisms at work in Bell’s theory. As a corollary of his general stance, Bell mentions that to understand art we do not need to know anything about art-history. It may be that from works of art we can draw inferences as to the sort of people who made them; but an intimate understanding of an artist will not tell us whether his pictures are any good. This point again relates to Bell’s contention that pure aesthetics is concerned only with the question of whether or not objects have a specific emotional significance to us. Other questions, he believes, are not questions for aesthetics:

To appreciate a man’s art I need know nothing whatever about the artist; I can say whether this picture is better than that without the help of history, but if I am trying to account for the deterioration of his art, I shall be helped by knowing that he has been seriously ill… To mark the deterioration was to make a pure, aesthetic judgement: to account for it was to become an historian. (1913, pp.44-5, emphasis added)

The above passage illustrates an element of Bell’s account some subsequent thinkers have been keen to preserve. Bell holds that attributing value to a work purely on the basis of the position it holds within an art-historical tradition, (because it is by Picasso, or marks the advent of cubism) is not a pursuit of aesthetics. Although certain features and relations may be interesting historically, aesthetically these can be of no consequence. Indeed valuing an object because it is old, interesting, rare, or precious can over-cloud one’s aesthetic sensibility and puts one at a disadvantage compared to the viewer who knows and cares nothing of the object under consideration. Representation is, also, nothing to do with art’s value according to Bell. Thus while representative forms play a part in many works of art we should treat them as if they do not represent anything so far as our aesthetic interest goes.

It is fairly well acknowledged that Bell had a non-philosophical agenda for these kinds of claims. It is easy to see in Bell a defense of the value of abstract art over other art forms and this was indeed his intention. The extent to which Renaissance art can be considered great, for example, has nothing to do with representational accuracy but must be considered only in light of the formal qualities exhibited. In this manner many of the values formerly identified in artworks, and indeed movements, would have to be dismissed as deviations from the sole interest of the aesthetic: the pursuit of significant form.

There is a sense in which we should not underplay the role of the critic or philosopher who should be capable of challenging our accepted practices; capable of refining or cultivating our tastes. To this end Bell’s claims are not out of place. However, while there is some tendency to reflect upon purely formal qualities of a work of art rather than artistic technique or various associations; while there is a sense in which many artists attempt to depict something beyond the evident (utility driven) perceptual shallowness that can dictate our perceptual dealings, it remains obscure why this should be our only interest. Unfortunately, the exclusionary nature of Bell’s account seems only to be concerned with the aesthetic narrowly conceived, excluding any possibility of the development of, or importance of, other values and interests, both as things stand and in future artistic development. Given the qualitative claim Bell demands concerning the superior value of significant form this appears more and more troubling with the increasing volume of works (and indeed values) that would have to be ignored under Bell’s formulation.

As a case in point (perhaps a contentious one but there are any number of related examples), consider Duchamp’s Fountain (1917). In line with much of the criticism referred to in Part 1, the problem is that because Bell identifies aesthetic value (as he construes it) with “art-hood” itself, Artistic Formalism has nothing to say about a urinal that purports to be anti-aesthetic and yet art. Increasingly, artworks are recognised as such and valued for reasons other than the presence (or precisely because of their lack) of aesthetic properties, or exhibited beauty. The practice continues, the works are criticised and valued, and formalists of this kind can do very little but stamp their feet. The death of Artistic Formalism is apparently heralded by the departure of practice from theory.

d. Conclusions: From Artistic to (Moderate) Aesthetic Formalism

So what are we to take from Bell’s account? His claims that our interactions with certain artworks yield an emotion peculiar to the aesthetic, and not experienced in our everyday emotional lives, is rightly met with consternation. It is unclear why we should recognise such a reaction to be of a different kind (let alone a more valuable kind) to those experienced in other contexts such as to discount many of our reactions to ostensible aesthetic objects as genuine aesthetic responses. Few are prompted by Bell’s account to accept this determination of the aesthetic nor does it seem to satisfactorily capture all that we should want to in this area. However, Bell’s aim in producing this theory was (ostensibly) to capture something common to aesthetic objects. In appealing to a timeless emotion that will not be subject to the contingencies of any specific era, Bell seemingly hoped to account for the enduring values of works throughout time. It is easy enough to recognise this need and the place Bell’s theory is supposed to hold in satisfying what does appear to be a sensible requirement. It is less clear that this path, if adequately pursued, should be found to be fruitless.

That we should define the realm of the aesthetic in virtue of those works that stand the test of time has been intuitive to some; how else are we to draw together all those objects worthy of theoretical inclusion whilst characterising and discounting failed works, impostors, and anomalies? Yet there is something disconcerting about this procedure. That we should ascribe the label “art” or even “aesthetic” to a conjunction of objects that have, over time, continued to impress on us some valuable property, seems to invite a potentially worrying commitment to relativity. The preceding discussion has given some voice to a familiar enough contention that by indexing value to our current sensibility we stand to dismiss things that might have been legitimately valued in the past. Bell’s willingness to acknowledge, even rally for, the importance of abstract art leads him to a theory that identifies the value of works throughout history only on the basis of their displaying qualities (significant form) that he took to be important. The cost (although for Bell this is no cost) of such a theory is that things like representational dexterity (a staple of the Renaissance) must be struck from the list of aesthetically valuable properties, just as the pursuit of such a quality by artists must be characterised as misguided.

The concern shared by those who criticise Bell seems to stem from an outlook according to which any proposed theory should be able to capture and accommodate the moving trends, interests and evaluations that constitute art history and drive the very development of artistic creation. This is what one expects an art theory to be able to do. This is where Artistic Formalism fails, as art-practice and art theory diverge. Formalism, as a theory of art, is ill suited to make ontological distinctions between genuine- and non-art. A theory whose currency is perceptually available value will be ill-equipped to officiate over a practice that is governed by, amongst other things, institutional considerations; in fact a practice that is able to develop precisely by identifying recognised values and then subverting them. For these reasons it seems obvious that Formalism is not a bad theory of art but is no theory of art at all.

This understood, one can begin to see those elements of Bell’s Formalism that may be worth salvaging and those that must be rejected. For instance, Bell ascribes a particular domain to aesthetic judgements, reactions, and evaluations such as to distinguish a number of other pronouncements that can also be made in reference to the object in question (some, perhaps, deserve to be labelled “aesthetic” but some—arguably—do not). Bell can say of Picasso’s Guernica (1937) that the way it represents and expresses various things about the Spanish Civil War might well be politically and historically interesting (and valuable)—and might lead to the ascription of various properties to the work (being moving, or harsh). Likewise, the fact that it is by Picasso (or is a genuine Picasso rather than a forgery) will be of interest to some and might also lead to the ascription of certain properties. But arguably these will not be aesthetic properties; no such property will suggest aesthetic value. Conversely, the fact that a particular object is a fake is often thought to devalue the work; for many it may even take away the status of work-hood. But for Bell if the object were genuinely indistinguishable from the original, then it will be capable of displaying the same formal relations and will thus exhibit equal aesthetic value. It is this identification of aesthetic value with formal properties of the work that appears—for some—to continue to hold some plausibility.

However, there have been few (if any) sympathisers towards Bell’s insistence that only if something displayed value in virtue of its formal features would it count as art, or as valuable in an aesthetic. A more moderate position would be to ascribe a particular domain to formal aesthetic judgements, reactions and evaluations, while distinguishing these from both non-formal aesthetic judgements, and non-aesthetic (for example, artistic, political, historical) judgements. On this kind of approach, Bell’s mistake was two-fold: Bell ran into difficulties when he (1) attempted to tie Formalism to the nature of art itself, and (2) restricted the aesthetic exclusively to a formal conception of beauty.

By construing formalism as an aesthetic theory (as an account of what constitutes aesthetic value) or as part of an aesthetic theory (as an account of one kind of aesthetic value), whilst at the same time admitting that there are other values to be had (both aesthetic and non-aesthetic), the Formalist needn’t go so far as to ordain the priority or importance of this specific value in the various practices in which it features. In this way, one can anticipate the stance of the Moderate Formalist who asserts (in terms reminiscent of Kant’s account) there to be two kinds of beauty: formal beauty, and non-formal beauty. Formal beauty is an aesthetic property that is entirely determined by “narrow” non-aesthetic properties (these include sensory and non-relational physical properties such as the lines and colours on the surface of a painting).  Non-formal beauty is determined by “broad” non-aesthetic properties (which covers anything else, including appeals to the content-related aspects that would be required to ascertain the aptness or suitability of certain features for the intended end of the painting, or the accuracy of a representational portrait, or the category to which an artwork belongs).

While these notions require much clarification (see Part 3), a useful way to express the aspirations of this account would be to note that the Moderate Formalist claims that their metaphysical stance generates the only theory capable of accommodating the aesthetic properties of all works of art. Unlike Bell’s “extreme Formalism”, maintaining all aesthetic properties to be narrowly determined by sensory and intrinsic physical properties; and unlike “anti-Formalism”, according to which all aesthetic properties are at least partly determined by broad non-aesthetic properties such as the artist’s intentions, or the artwork’s history of production; the Moderate Formalist insists that, in the context of the philosophy of art, many artworks have a mix of formal and non-formal aesthetic properties; that others have only non-formal aesthetic properties; and that at least some artworks have only formal aesthetic properties.

3. Nick Zangwill’s Moderate Aesthetic Formalism

The issue of formalism is introduced on the assumption that aesthetic properties are determined by certain non-aesthetic properties; versions of formalism differ primarily in their answers to the question of which non-aesthetic properties are of interest. This part of the presentation briefly outlines the central characterisations of “form” (and their differences) that will be pertinent to an understanding of twenty-first century discussions of Formalism. For present purposes, and in light of the previous discussion, it will be satisfactory to focus on formal characterisations of artworks and, more specifically visual art.

a. Extreme Formalism, Moderate Formalism, Anti-Formalism

Nick Zangwill recognises that arrangements of lines, shapes, and colours (he includes “shininess” and “glossiness” as colour properties) are typically taken as formal properties, contrasting these with non-formal properties which are determined, in part, by the history of production or context of creation for the artwork. In capturing this divide, he writes:

The most straightforward account would be to say that formal properties are those aesthetic properties that are determined solely by sensory or physical properties—so long as the physical properties in question are not relations to other things or other times. This would capture the intuitive idea that formal properties are those aesthetic properties that are directly perceivable or that are determined by properties that are directly perceivable. (2001, p.56)

Noting that this will not accommodate the claims of some philosophers that aesthetic properties are “dispositions to provoke responses in human beings”, Zangwill stipulates the word “narrow” to include sensory properties, non-relational physical properties, and dispositions to provoke responses that might be thought part-constitutive of aesthetic properties; the word “broad” covers anything else (such as the extrinsic property of the history of production of a work). We can then appeal to a basic distinction: "Formal properties are entirely determined by narrow nonaesthetic properties, whereas nonformal aesthetic properties are partly determined by broad nonaesthetic properties." (2001, p.56)

On this basis, Zangwill identifies Extreme Formalism as the view that all aesthetic properties of an artwork are formal (and narrowly determined), and Anti-Formalism as the view that no aesthetic properties of an artwork are formal (all are broadly determined by history of production as well as narrow non-aesthetic properties). His own view is a Moderate Formalism, holding that some aesthetic properties of an artwork are formal, others are not. He motivates this view via a number of strategies but in light of earlier parts of this discussion it will be appropriate to focus on Zangwill’s responses to those arguments put forward by the anti-formalist.

b. Responding to Kendall Walton’s Anti-Formalism

Part 1 briefly considersed Kendall Walton’s influential position according to which in order to make any aesthetic judgement regarding a work of art one must see it under an art-historical category. This claim was made in response to various attempts to “purge from criticism of works of art supposedly extraneous excursions into matters not (or not “directly”) available to inspection of the works, and to focus attention on the works themselves” (See, for example, the discussion of Clive Bell in Part 2). In motivating this view Walton offers what he supposes to be various “intuition pumps” that should lead to the acceptance of his proposal.

In defense of a moderate formalist view Nick Zangwill has asserted that Walton’s thesis is at best only partly accurate. For Zangwill, there is a large and significant class of works of art and aesthetic properties of works of art that are purely formal; in Walton’s terms the aesthetic properties of these objects emerge from the “configuration of colours and shapes on a painting” alone. This would suggest a narrower determination of those features of a work “available to inspection” than Walton defends in his claim that the history of production (a non-formal feature) of a work partly determines its aesthetic properties by determining the category to which the work belongs and must be perceived. Zangwill wants to resist Walton’s claim that all or most works and values are category-dependent; aiming to vindicate the disputed negative thesis that “the application of aesthetic concepts to a work of art can leave out of consideration facts about its origin”. Zangwill is keen to point out that a number of the intuition pumps Walton utilises are less decisive than has commonly been accepted.

Regarding representational properties, for example, Walton asks us to consider a marble bust of a Roman emperor which seems to us to resemble a man with, say, an aquiline nose, a wrinkled brow, and an expression of grim determination, and about which we take to represent a man with, or as having, those characteristics. The question is why don’t we say that it resembles or represents a motionless man, of uniform (marble) colour, who is severed at the chest? We are interested in representation and it seems the object is in more respects similar to the latter description than the former. Walton is able to account for the fact that we are not struck by the similarity in the latter sense as we are by the former by appeal to his distinction between standard, contra-standard and variable properties:

The bust’s uniform color, motionlessness, and abrupt ending at the chest are standard properties relative to the category of busts, and since we see it as a bust they are standard for us. […] A cubist work might look like a person with a cubical head to someone not familiar with the cubist style. But the standardness of such cubical shapes for people who see it as a cubist work prevents them from making that comparison. (1970, p.345)

His central claim is that what we take a work to represent (or even resemble) depends only on the variable properties, and not those that are standard, for the category under which we perceive it. It seems fairly obvious that this account must be right. Zangwill agrees and is hence led to accept that in the case of representational qualities there is nothing in the objects themselves that could tell the viewer which of the opposing descriptions is appropriate. For this, one must look elsewhere to such things as the history of production or the conventionally accepted practices according to which the object’s intentional content may be derived.

Zangwill argues that while representational properties might not be aesthetic properties (indeed they are possessed by ostensibly non-aesthetic, non-art items such as maps, blueprints, and road signs) they do appear to be among the base (non-aesthetic) properties that determine aesthetic properties. Given that representational properties of a work are, in part, determined by the history of production, and assuming that some aesthetic properties of representational works are partly determined by what they represent, Zangwill concludes some aesthetic properties to be non-formal. This is no problem for the Moderate Formalist of course; Walton’s intuition pump does not lead to an anti-formalist argument for it seems equally clear that only a subclass of artworks are representational works. Many works have no representational properties at all and are thus unaffected by the insistence that representational properties can only be successfully identified via the presence of art-historical or categorical information. Given that Zangwill accepts Walton’s claim in respect only to a subclass of aesthetic objects, Moderate Formalism remains undisturbed.

However, Walton offers other arguments that might be thought to have a more general application and thus forestall this method of “tactical retreat” on the part of the would-be Moderate Formalist. The claim that Walton seems to hold for all artworks (rather than just a subclass) is that the art-historical category into which an artwork falls is aesthetically relevant because one’s belief that a work falls under a particular category affects one’s perception of it—one experiences the work differently when one experiences it under a category. Crucially, understanding a work’s category is a matter of understanding the degrees to which its features are standard, contra-standard and variable with respect to that category. Here is Walton’s most well-known example:

Imagine a society which does not have an established medium of painting, but does produce a kind of work called guernicas. Guernicas are like versions of Picasso’s “Guernica” done in various bas-relief dimensions. All of them are surfaces with the colours and shapes of Picasso’s “Guernica,” but the surfaces are moulded to protrude from the wall like relief maps of different kinds of terrain. […] Picasso’s “Guernica” would be counted as a guernica in this society - a perfectly flat one - rather than as a painting. Its flatness is variable and the figures on its surface are standard relative to the category of guernicas. […] This would make for a profound difference between our reaction to “Guernica” and theirs. (1970, p.347)

When we consider (as a slight amendment to Walton’s example) a guernica in this society that is physically indistinguishable from Picasso’s painting, we should become aware of the different aesthetic responses experienced by members of their society compared to ours. Walton notes that it seems violent, dynamic, vital, disturbing to us, but imagines it would strike them as cold, stark, lifeless, restful, or perhaps bland, dull, boring—but in any case not violent, dynamic, and vital. His point is that the object is only violent and disturbing as a painting, but dull, stark, and so forth as a guernica, hence the thought experiment is supposed to prompt us to agree that aesthetic properties are dependent on (or relative to) the art-historical categories under which the observer subsumes the object in question. Through this example Walton argues that we do not simply judge that an artwork is dynamic and a painting. The only sense in which it is appropriate to claim that Guernica is dynamic is in claiming that it is dynamic as a painting, or for people who see it as a painting.

This analysis has been variously accepted in the literature; it is particularly interesting, therefore, to recognise Zangwill’s initial suspicion of Walton’s account. He notes that a plausible block to this intuition comes in the observation that it becomes very difficult to make aesthetic judgements about whole categories or comparisons of items across categories. Zangwill stipulates that Walton might respond with the claim that we simply widen the categories utilised in our judgements. For example, when we say that Minoan art is (in general) more dynamic than Mycenean art, what we are saying is that this is how it is when we consider both sorts of works as belonging to the class of “prehistoric Greek art”. He continues:

But why should we believe this story? It does not describe a psychological process that we are aware of when we make cross-category judgements. The insistence that we are subconsciously operating with some more embracing category, even though we are not aware of it, seems to be an artefact of the anti-formalist theory that there is no independent reason to believe. If aesthetic judgements are category-dependent, we would expect speakers and thinkers to be aware of it. But phenomenological reflection does not support the category-dependent view. (2001, pp. 92-3)

In these cases, according to Zangwill, support does not appear to be sourced either from phenomenology or from our inferential behaviour. Instead he argues that we can offer an alternative account of what is going on when we say something is “elegant for a C” or “an elegant C”. This involves the claim that questions of goodness and elegance are matters of degree. We often make ascriptions that refer to a comparison class because this is a quicker and easier way of communicating questions of degree. But the formalist will say that the precise degree of some C-thing’s elegance does not involve the elegance of other existing C-things. And being a matter of degree is quite different from being category-dependent. So Zangwill’s claim is that it is pragmatically convenient, but far from essential, that one make reference to a category-class in offering an aesthetic judgement. We are able to make category-neutral aesthetic judgements, and crucially for Zangwill, such judgements are fundamental: category-dependent judgements are only possible because of category-neutral ones. The formalist will hold that without the ability to make category-neutral judgements we would have no basis for comparisons; Walton has not shown that this is not the case.

In this way Zangwill asserts that we can understand that it is appropriate to say that the flat guernica is “lifeless” because it is less lively than most guernicas— but this selection of objects is a particularly lively one. Picasso’s Guernica is appropriately thought of as “vital” because it is more so than most paintings; considered as a class these are not particularly lively. But in fact the painting and the guernica might be equally lively, indeed equivalent in respect of their other aesthetic properties—they only appear to differ in respect of the comparative judgements in which they have been embedded. It is for this reason that Zangwill concludes that we can refuse to have our intuitions “pumped” in the direction Walton intends. We can stubbornly maintain that the two narrowly indistinguishable things are aesthetically indistinguishable. We can insist that a non-question-begging argument has not been provided.

On this view, one can allow that reference to art-historical categories is a convenient way of classifying art, artists, and art movements, but the fact that this convenience has been widely utilised need not be telling against alternative accounts of aesthetic value.

c. Kant’s Formalism

Zangwill’s own distinction between formal and non-formal properties is derived (broadly) from Immanuel Kant’s distinction between free and dependent beauty. Indeed, Zangwill has asserted that “Kant was also a moderate formalist, who opposed extreme formalism when he distinguished free and dependent beauty in §16 of the Critique of Judgement” (2005, p.186). In the section in question Kant writes:

There are two kinds of beauty; free beauty (pulchritudo vaga), or beauty which is merely dependent (pulchritudo adhaerens). The first presupposes no concept of what the object should be; the second does presuppose such a concept and, with it, an answering perfection of the object.

On the side of free beauty Kant lists primarily natural objects such as flowers, some birds, and crustacea, but adds wallpaper patterns and musical fantasias; examples of dependent beauties include the beauty of a building such as a church, palace, or summer-house. Zangwill maintains that dependent beauty holds the key to understanding the non-formal aesthetic properties of art—without this notion it will be impossible to understand the aesthetic importance of pictorial representation, or indeed any of the art-forms he analyses. A work that is intended to be a representation of a certain sort—if that intention is successfully realised—will fulfil the representational function the artist intended, and may (it is claimed) do so beautifully. In other words, some works have non-formal aesthetic properties because of (or in virtue of) the way they embody some historically given non-aesthetic function.

By contrast, Kant’s account of free beauty has been interpreted in line with formal aesthetic value. At §16 and §17, Kant appears to place constraints on the kinds of objects that can exemplify pure (that is, formal) beauty, suggesting that nature, rather than art, provides the proper objects of (pure) aesthetic judgement and that to the extent that artworks can be (pure) objects of tastes they must be abstract, non-representational, works. If this is a consequence of Kant’s account, the strong Formalist position derived from judgements of pure beauty would presumably have to be restricted in application to judgements of abstract art and, perhaps in quotidian cases, the objects of nature. However, several commentators (for example, Crawford (1974) and Guyer (1997)) have maintained that Kant’s distinction between free and dependent beauty does not entail the classification of art (even representational art) as merely dependently beautiful. Crawford, for example, takes the distinction between free and dependent beauty to turn on the power of the judger to abstract towards a disinterested position; this is because he takes Kant’s distinction to be between kinds of judgement and not between kinds of object.

This is not the place for a detailed exegesis of Kant’s aesthetics, but it is pertinent to at least note the suggestion that it is nature (rather than art) that provides the paradigm objects of formal aesthetic judgement. In the next part of this presentation we will explore this possibility, further considering Zangwill’s moderate, and more extreme Formalist conclusions in the domain of nature appreciation.

4. From Art to the Aesthetic Appreciation of Nature

Allen Carlson is well known for his contribution to the area broadly known as “environmental aesthetics”, perhaps most notably for his discussion of the aesthetic appreciation of nature (2000). Where discussing the value of art Carlson seems to adopt a recognisably moderate formalist position, acknowledging both that where formalists like Bell went wrong was in presupposing formalism to be the only valid way to appreciate visual artworks (pace Part 2), but also suggesting that a “proper perspective” on the application of formalism should have revealed it to be one among many “orientations” deserving recognition in art appreciation (pace Part 3). However, when turning to the appreciation of the natural environment Carlson adopts and defends a strongly anti-formalist position, occupying a stance that has been referred to as “cognitive naturalism”. This part of the presentation briefly discusses Carlson’s rejection of formalism before presenting some moderate, and stronger formalist replies in this domain.

a. Anti-Formalism and Nature

Carlson has characterised contemporary debates in the aesthetics of nature as attempting to distance nature appreciation from theories of the appreciation of art. Contemporary discussion introduces different models for the appreciation of nature in place of the inadequate attempts to apply artistic norms to an environmental domain. For example, in his influential “Appreciation and the Natural Environment” (1979) he had disputed both “object” and “landscape” models of nature appreciation (which might be thought attractive to the Moderate Formalist), favouring the “natural environmental” model (which stands in opposition to the other two). Carlson acknowledged that the “object” model has some utility in the art-world regarding the appreciation of non-representational sculpture (he takes Brancusi’s Bird in Space (1919) as an example). Such sculpture can have significant (formal) aesthetic properties yet no representational connections to the rest of reality or relational connections with its immediate surroundings. Indeed, he acknowledges that the formalist intuitions discussed earlier have remained prevalent in the domain of nature appreciation, meeting significant and sustained opposition only in the domain of art criticism.

When it comes to nature-appreciation, formalism has remained relatively uncontested and popular, emerging as an assumption in many theoretical discussions. However, Carlson’s conclusion on the “object” and “landscape” models is that the former rips natural objects from their larger environments while the latter frames and flattens them into scenery. In focussing mainly on formal properties, both models neglect much of our normal experience and understanding of nature.  The “object” model is inappropriate as it cannot recognise the organic unity between natural objects and their environment of creation or display, such environments are—Carlson believes—aesthetically relevant. This model thus imposes limitations on our appreciation of natural objects as a result of the removal of the object from its surroundings (which this model requires in order to address the questions of what and how to appreciate). For Carlson, the natural environment cannot be broken down into discrete parts, divorced from their former environmental relations any more than it can be reduced to a static, two-dimensional scene (as in the “landscape” model). Instead he holds that the natural environment must be appreciated for what it is, both nature and an environment. On this view natural objects possess an organic unity with their environment of creation: they are a part of and have developed out of the elements of their environments by means of the forces at work within those environments. Thus some understanding of the environments of creation is relevant to the aesthetic appreciation of natural objects.

The assumption implicit in the above rejection of Formalism is familiar from the objections (specifically regarding Walton) from Part 3. It is the suggestion that the appropriate way to appreciate some target object is via recourse to the kind of thing it is; taking the target for something it is not does not constitute appropriate aesthetic appreciation of that thing. Nature is natural so cannot be treated as “readymade” art. Carlson holds that the target for the appreciation of nature is also an environment, entailing that the appropriate mode of appreciation is active, involved appreciation. It is the appreciation of a judge who is in the environment, being part of and reacting to it, rather than merely being an external onlooker upon a two-dimensional scene. It is this view that leads to his strong anti-formalist suggestion that the natural environment as such does not possess formal qualities. For example, responding to the “landscape” model Carlson suggests that the natural environment itself only appears to have formal qualities when a person somehow imposes a frame upon it and thus formally composes the resultant view. In such a case it is the framed view that has the qualities, but these will vary depending upon the frame and the viewer’s position. As a consequence Carlson takes the formal features of nature, such as they are, to be (nearly) infinitely realisable; insofar as the natural environment has formal qualities, they have an indeterminateness, making them both difficult to appreciate, and of little significance in the appreciation of nature.

Put simply, the natural environment is not an object, nor is it a static two-dimensional “picture”, thus it cannot be appreciated in ways satisfactory for objects or pictures; furthermore, the rival models discussed do not reveal significant or sufficiently determinate appreciative features. In rejecting these views Carlson has been concerned with the questions of what and how we should appreciate; his answer involves the necessary acknowledgement that we are appreciating x qua x, where some further conditions will be specifiable in relation to the nature of the x in question. It is in relation to this point that Carlson’s anti-formalist “cognitive naturalism” presents itself.

In this respect his stance on nature appreciation differs from Walton’s, who did not extend his philosophical claims to aesthetic judgements about nature (Walton lists clouds, mountains, sunsets), believing that these judgements, unlike judgements of art, are best understood in terms of a category-relative interpretation. By contrast, Carlson can be understood as attempting to extend Walton’s category dependent account of art-appreciation to the appreciation of nature. On this view we do not need to treat nature as we treat those artworks about whose origins we know nothing because it is not the case that we know nothing of nature:

In general we do not produce, but rather discover, natural objects and aspects of nature. Why should we therefore not discover the correct categories for their perception? We discover whales and later discover that, in spite of somewhat misleading perceptual properties, they are in fact mammals and not fish. (Carlson, 2000, p.64)

By discovering the correct categories to which objects or environments belong, we can know which is the correct judgement to make (the whale is not a lumbering and inelegant fish). It is in virtue of this that Carlson claims our judgements of the aesthetic appreciation of nature sustain responsible criticism in the way Walton characterises the appreciation of art. It is for this reason that Carlson concludes that for the aesthetic appreciation of nature, something like the knowledge and experience of the naturalist or ecologist is essential. This knowledge gives us the appropriate foci of aesthetic significance and the appropriate boundaries of the setting so that our experience becomes one of aesthetic appreciation. He concludes that the absence of such knowledge, or any failure to perceive nature under the correct categories, leads to aesthetic omission and, indeed, deception.

b. Formalism and Nature.

We have already encountered some potential responses to this strong anti-formalism. The moderate formalist may attempt to deploy a version of the aesthetic/non-aesthetic distinction such as to deny that the naturalist and ecologist are any better equipped than the rest of us to aesthetically appreciate nature. They are, of course, better equipped to understand nature, and to evaluate (in what we might call a “non-aesthetic” sense) the objects and environments therein. This type of response claims that the ecologist can judge (say) the perfectly self-contained and undisturbed ecosystem, can indeed respond favourably to her knowledge of the rarity of such a find. Such things are valuable in that they are of natural-historical interest. Such things are of interest and significance to natural-historians, no doubt. The naturalist will know that the whale is not “lumbering” compared to most fish (and will not draw this comparison), and will see it as “whale-like”, “graceful”, perhaps particularly “sprightly” compared to most whales. One need not deny that such comparative, cognitive judgements can feel a particular way, or that such judgements are a significant part of the appreciation of nature; but it may be possible to deny that these (or only these) judgements deserve to be called aesthetic.

However, Carlson’s objection is not to the existence of formal value, but to the appropriateness of consideration of such value. Our knowledge of an environment is supposed to allow us to select certain foci of aesthetic significance and abstract from, or exclude, others such as to characterise different kinds of appropriate experience:

…we must survey a prairie environment, looking at the subtle contours of the land, feeling the wind blowing across the open space, and smelling the mix of prairie grasses and flowers. But such an act of aspection has little place in a dense forest environment. Here we must examine and scrutinise, inspecting the detail of the forest floor, listening carefully for the sounds of birds and smelling carefully for the scent of spruce and pine. (Carlson, 2000, p.64)

Clearly knowledge of the terrain and environment that is targeted in each of these cases might lead the subject to be particularly attentive to signs of certain expected elements; however, there are two concerns that are worth highlighting in closing.

Firstly, it is unclear why one should, for all one’s knowledge of the expected richness or desolation of some particular landscape, be in a position to assume of (say) the prairie environment that no detailed local scrutiny should yield the kind of interest or appreciation (both formal and non-formal) that might be found in other environments. It is unclear whether Carlson could allow that such acts might yield appreciation but must maintain that they would not yield instances of aesthetic appreciation of that environment, or whether he is denying the availability of such unpredicted values—in either case the point seems questionable. Perhaps the suspicion is one that comes from proportioning one’s expectation to one’s analysis of the proposed target. The first concern is thus that knowledge (even accurate knowledge) can be as potentially blinding as it is potentially enlightening.

The second concern is related to the first, but poses more of a direct problem for Carlson. His objection to the “object” and “landscape” models regards their propensity to limit the potentiality for aesthetic judgement by taking the target to be something other than it truly is. Part of the problem described above relates to worries regarding the reduction of environments to general categories like prairie landscape, dense forest, pastoral environment such that one enlists expectations of those attentions that will and will not be rewarded, and limits one’s interaction accordingly. While it might be true that some understanding of the kind of environment we are approaching will suggest certain values to expect as well as indicating the act of aspection appropriate for delivering just these, the worry is that this account may be unduly limiting because levels of appreciation are unlikely to exceed the estimations of the theory and the acts of engagement and interaction these provoke. In nature more than anywhere else this seems to fail to do justice to those intuitions that the target really is (amongst other things) a rich, unconstrained sensory manifold. To briefly illustrate the point with a final example, Zangwill (2001, pp.116-8) considers such cases (which he doesn’t think Carlson can account for) as the unexpected or incongruous beauty of the polar bear swimming underwater. Not only is this “the last thing we expected”, but our surprise shows that

…it is not a beauty that we took to be dependent in some way upon our grasp of its polar-bearness. We didn’t find it elegant as a polar bear. It is a category-free beauty. The underwater polar bear is a beautiful thing in beautiful motion…

The suggestion here is that to “do justice to” and thus fully appreciate the target one must be receptive not simply to the fact that it is nature, or that it is an environment, but that it is, first and foremost, the individual environment that it (and not our understanding of it) reveals itself to be. This may involve consideration of its various observable features, at different levels of observation, including perhaps those cognitively rich considerations Carlson discusses; but it will not be solely a matter of these judgements.  According to the (Moderate) Formalist, the “true reality” of things is more than Carlson’s account seems capable of capturing, for while a natural environment is not in fact a static two-dimensional scene, it may well in fact possess (amongst other things) a particular appearance for us, and that appearance may be aesthetically valuable. The Moderate Formalist can accommodate that value without thereby omitting acknowledgement of other kinds of values, including those Carlson defends.

Finally, it should be noted that when it comes to inorganic nature, Zangwill has argued for a stronger formalist position (much closer to Bell’s view about visual art). The basic argument for this conclusion is that even if a case can be made for claiming that much of organic nature should be understood and appreciated via reference to some kind of “history of production” (typically in terms of biological functions, usually thought to depend on evolutionary history), inorganic or non-biological nature (rivers, rocks, sunsets, the rings of Saturn) does not have functions and therefore cannot have aesthetic properties that depend on functions. Nor should we aesthetically appreciate inorganic things in the light of functions they do not have.

5. Conclusions

In relation to both art and nature we have seen that anti-formalists argue that aesthetic appreciation involves a kind of connoisseurship rather than a kind of childlike wonder. Bell’s extreme (artistic) formalism appeared to recommend a rather restricted conception of the art-connoisseur. Walton’s and Carlson’s anti-formalism (in relation to art and nature respectively) both called for the expertise and knowledge base required to identify and apply the “correct” category under which an item of appreciation must be subsumed. Yet the plausibility of challenges to these stances (both the strong formalism of Bell and the strong anti-formalism of Walton and Carlson) appears to be grounded in more moderate, tolerant proposals. Zangwill, for example, defends his moderate formalism as “a plea for open-mindedness” under the auspices of attempts to recover some of our aesthetic innocence.

This presentation began with an historical overview intended to help situate (though not necessarily motivate or defend) the intuition that there is some important sense in which aesthetic qualities pertain to the appearance of things. Anti-formalists point out that beauty, ugliness, and other aesthetic qualities often (or always) pertain to appearances as informed by our beliefs and understanding about the reality of things. Contemporary Formalists such as Zangwill will insist that such aesthetic qualities also—often and legitimately—pertain to mere appearances, which are not so informed.

On this more moderate approach, the aesthetic responses of the connoisseur, the art-historian, the ecologist can be acknowledged while nonetheless insisting that the sophisticated aesthetic sensibility has humble roots and we should not forget them. Formal aesthetic appreciation may be more “raw, naïve, and uncultivated” (Zangwill, 2005, p.186), but arguably it has its place.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Bell, Clive (1913) Art Boston, Massachusetts.
    • An important presentation and defense of Artistic Formalism in the Philosophy of Art.
  • Budd, Malcolm (1996) ‘The Aesthetic Appreciation of Nature’ British Journal of Aesthetics 36, pp.207-222
    • For some important challenges to the anti-formalist views put forward by Carlson (2000); in particular, Budd supports the intuition that part of the value of nature relates to its boundless, unconstrained, and variable potential for appreciation.
  • Carey, John (2005) What Good are the Arts? London: Faber and Faber
    • While pertinent, Carey’s discussion should be treated with some caution as, unlike McLaughlin (1977), he writes with a tone that seeks to trivialise Bell’s position and, at times, apparently misses the acuity with which Bell presented his formulation.
  • Carlson, Allen, (1979) ‘Appreciation and the Natural Environment’ The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 37, pp. 267-275
    • An early indication and defense of Carlson’s “Natural environmental” model of appreciation (compare Carlson (2000)).
  • Carlson, Allen (2000) Aesthetics and the Environment, Art and Architecture London and New York: Routledge
    • An influential book in which Carlson draws together much of his work over the previous two decades.
  • Crawford, Donald (1974) Kant’s Aesthetic Theory Madison: Wisconsin University Press
    • A scholarly and influential engagement with Kant’s Critique of Judgement (see also Guyer (1997)).
  • Currie, Gregory (1989) An Ontology of Art Basingstoke: Macmillan
    • See Chapter 3 especially for a discussion of “Aesthetic Empiricism” in connection with the anti-formalist arguments discussed in Part 1.
  • Danto, Arthur (1981) The Transfiguration of the Commonplace Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press
    • For Danto, Warhol’s Brillo Box exhibition (1964) marked a watershed in the history of aesthetics, rendering almost worthless everything written by philosophers on art. Warhol’s sculptures were indistinguishable from ordinary Brillo boxes, putatively showing that an artwork needn’t posses some special perceptually discernible quality in order to afford art-status.
  • Davies, David (2004) Art as Performance Oxford: Blackwell
    • For a discussion of “Aesthetic Empiricism” and some development/departure from Currie’s ontology of art (1989).
  • Dowling, Christopher (2010) 'Zangwill, Moderate Formalism, and another look at Kant’s Aesthetic', Kantian Review 15, pp.90-117
    • Explores the formalist interpretation of Kant’s aesthetics in connection with Zangwill’s moderate formalism.
  • Dutton, Dennis (1983) [ed.] The Forger’s Art Berkeley and Los Angeles, CA.: University of California Press
    • An important collection of articles, including Leonard Meyer’s ‘Forgery and The Anthropology of Art’ (discussed in Part 1); See also, articles in this collection by Alfred Lessing and Jack Meiland.
  • Fry, Roger ([1920] 1956) Vision and Design Cleveland and New York: World Publishing
    • Fry’s collection of essays gives some insight into the changing ideas on European Post Impressionism around the turn of the century. The development of Fry’s aesthetic theory (in relation to significant form) is also discussed by Bell (1913).
  • Guyer, Paul (1997) Kant and the Claims of Taste [2nd Edition] Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
    • A clear and comprehensive critical exploration of Kant’s Critique of Judgement.
  • Hanslick, Eduard (1957) The Beautiful in Music [trans. Gustav Cohen] Indianapolis and New York: Bobbs-Merrill Co
    • In this influential text by “the father of modern musical criticism”, Hanslick arguably lays out much of the groundwork for musical formalism.
  • Kant, Immanuel (1952) Critique of Judgement, [trans. Meredith] Oxford: Clarendon Press
  • McLaughlin, Thomas (1977) ‘Clive Bell’s Aesthetic: Tradition and Significant Form’, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 35, pp435-7
    • A critical discussion of Bell’s Formalism.
  • Parsons, Glenn (2004) 'Natural Functions and the Aesthetic Appreciation of Inorganic Nature', British Journal of Aesthetics 44, pp.44-56
    • Parsons presents some challenges to Zangwill's extreme formalism about inorganic nature (for a reply to Parsons see Zangwill, 2005).
  • Walton, Kendall (1970) ‘Categories of Art’, The Philosophical Review 79, pp.334-367
    • A very influential contribution to analytic aesthetics in support of the anti-formalist stance regarding the appreciation of an artwork’s aesthetic properties.
  • Wilcox, John (1953) ‘The Beginnings of L’art pour L’art’, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 11, pp.360-377
    • An instructive article that has informed much of Part 1 of this presentation, and in which you will find references to many of the nineteenth century texts cited here.
  • Wimsatt, W. and Beardsley, M. (1946) ‘The Intentional Fallacy’, Sewanee Review 54, pp.468-88
    • The authors argue against the view that an artwork’s meaning is determined by reference to the artist’s intentions.
  • Zangwill, Nick (2001) The Metaphysics of Beauty, Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press
    • A thorough exploration and defense of formalist intuitions; the book includes re-printed versions of many of Zangwill’s important contributions (for example, his ‘Feasible Aesthetic Formalism’, Noús 33 (1999)) from earlier years.
  • Zangwill, Nick (2005) ‘In Defence of Extreme Formalism about Inorganic Nature: Reply to Parsons’, British Journal of Aesthetics, 45, pp.185-191


Author Information

Christopher Dowling
The Open University
United Kingdom