Phenomenal Conservatism

Phenomenal Conservatism is a theory in epistemology that seeks, roughly, to ground justified beliefs in the way things “appear” or “seem” to the subject who holds a belief. The theory fits with an internalistic form of foundationalism—that is, the view that some beliefs are justified non-inferentially (not on the basis of other beliefs), and that the justification or lack of justification for a belief depends entirely upon the believer’s internal mental states. The intuitive idea is that it makes sense to assume that things are the way they seem, unless and until one has reasons for doubting this.

This idea has been invoked to explain, in particular, the justification for perceptual beliefs and the justification for moral beliefs. Some believe that it can be used to account for all epistemic justification. It has been claimed that the denial of Phenomenal Conservatism (PC) leaves one in a self-defeating position, that PC naturally emerges from paradigmatic internalist intuitions, and that PC provides the only simple and natural solution to the threat of philosophical skepticism. Critics have objected that appearances should not be trusted in the absence of positive, independent evidence that appearances are reliable; that the theory allows absurd beliefs to be justified for some subjects; that the theory allows irrational or unreliable cognitive states to provide justification for beliefs; and that the theory has implausible implications regarding when and to what degree inferences produce justification for beliefs.

Table of Contents

  1. Understanding Phenomenal Conservatism
    1. Species of Appearance
    2. Defeasibility
    3. Kinds of Justification
    4. Comparison to Doxastic Conservatism
  2. The Nature of Appearance
    1. The Belief that P
    2. The Disposition to Believe that P
    3. The Belief that One Has Evidence for P
    4. The Experience View
    5. Appearance versus Acquaintance
  3. Arguments for Phenomenal Conservatism
    1. Intuitive Internalist Motivation
    2. An Internal Coherence Argument
    3. The Self-Defeat Argument
    4. Avoiding Skepticism
    5. Simplicity
  4. Objections
    1. Crazy Appearances
    2. Metajustification
    3. Cognitive Penetration and Tainted Sources
    4. Inferential Justification
  5. Summary
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Understanding Phenomenal Conservatism

a. Species of Appearance

The following is a recent formulation of the central thesis of phenomenal conservatism:

PC If it seems to S that P, then, in the absence of defeaters, S thereby has at least some justification for believing that P (Huemer 2007, p. 30; compare Huemer 2001, p. 99).

The phrase “it seems to S that P” is commonly understood in a broad sense that includes perceptual, intellectual, memory, and introspective appearances. For instance, as I look at the squirrel sitting outside the window now, it seems to me that there is a squirrel there; this is an example of a perceptual appearance (more specifically, a visual appearance). When I think about the proposition that no completely blue object is simultaneously red, it seems to me that this proposition is true; this is an intellectual appearance (more specifically, an intuition). When I think about my most recent meal, I seem to remember eating a tomatillo cake; this is a mnemonic (memory) appearance. And when I think about my current mental state, it seems to me that I am slightly thirsty; this is an introspective appearance.

b. Defeasibility

Appearances sometimes fail to correspond to reality, as in the case of illusions, hallucinations, false memories, and mistaken intuitions. Most philosophers agree that logically, this could happen across the board – that is, the world as a whole could be radically different from the way it appears. These observations do not conflict with phenomenal conservatism. Phenomenal conservatives do not hold that appearances are an infallible source of information, or even that they are guaranteed to be generally reliable. Phenomenal conservatives simply hold that to assume things are the way they appear is a rational default position, which one should maintain unless and until grounds for doubt (“defeaters”) appear. This is the reason for the phrase “in the absence of defeaters” in the above formulation of PC (section 1a).

These defeaters may take two forms. First, there might be rebutting defeaters, that is, evidence that what appears to be the case is in fact false. For instance, one might see a stick that appears bent when half-submerged in water. But one might then feel the stick, and find that it feels straight. The straight feel of the stick would provide a rebutting defeater for the proposition that the stick is bent.

Second, there might be undercutting defeaters, that is, evidence that one’s appearance (whether it be true or false) is unreliable or otherwise defective as a source of information. For instance, suppose one learns that an object that appears red is in fact illuminated by red lights. The red lighting is not by itself evidence that the object isn’t also red; however, the red lighting means that the look of the object is not a reliable indicator of its true color. Hence, the information about the unusual lighting conditions provides an undercutting defeater for the proposition that the object is red.

c. Kinds of Justification

Epistemologists commonly draw a (misleadingly named) distinction between “propositional justification” and “doxastic justification”, where propositional justification is justification that one has for believing something (whether or not one in fact believes it) and doxastic justification is justification that an actual belief possesses. The distinction is commonly motivated by pointing out that a person might have good reasons to believe a proposition and yet not believe it for any of those reasons, but instead believe it for some bad reason. For instance, I might be in possession of powerful scientific evidence supporting the theory of evolution, but yet my belief in the theory of evolution might actually be based entirely upon trust in the testimony of my tarot card reader. In that case, I would be said to have “propositional justification” but not “doxastic justification” for the theory of evolution.

It is commonly held that to have doxastic justification for P, an individual must satisfy two conditions: first, the individual must have propositional justification for P; second, the individual must base a belief that P on that propositional justification (or whatever confers that propositional justification). If we accept this view, then the phenomenal conservative should hold (i) that the appearance that P gives one propositional justification, in the absence of defeaters, for believing that P, and (ii) that if one believes that P on the basis of such an undefeated appearance, one thereby has doxastic justification for P.

Phenomenal conservatism was originally advanced as an account of foundational, or noninferential, justification (Huemer 2001, chapter 5). That is, it was advanced to explain how a person may be justified in believing that P without basing the belief that P on any other beliefs. Some hold that a variation of phenomenal conservatism may also be used to account for inferential justification – that is, that even when a person believes that P on the basis of other beliefs, the belief that P is justified in virtue of appearances (especially the “inferential appearance” that in the light of certain premises, P must be or is likely to be true) (Huemer 2013b, pp. 338-41); this last suggestion, however, remains controversial even among those sympathetic to PC.

d. Comparison to Doxastic Conservatism

A related but distinct view, sometimes called “epistemic conservatism” but better labeled “doxastic conservatism”, holds that a person’s merely believing that P gives that person some justification for P, provided that the person has no grounds for doubting that belief (Swinburne 2001, p. 141). (Etymological note: the term “doxastic” derives from the Greek word for belief [doxa], while “phenomenal” derives from the Greek word for appearance [phainomenon].)

Doxastic conservatism is an unpopular view, as it seems to endorse circular reasoning, or something very close to it. A thought experiment due to Richard Foley (1983) illustrates the counterintuitiveness of doxastic conservatism: suppose that S has some evidence for P which is almost but not quite sufficient to justify P. Suppose that S forms the belief that P anyway. If doxastic conservatism is correct, it seems, then as soon as S formed this belief, it would immediately become justified, since in addition to the evidence S already had for P, S would now have his belief that P serving as a source of justification, which would push S over the threshold for justified belief.

The phenomenal conservative aims to avoid this sort of implausibility. PC does not endorse circular reasoning, since it does not hold that a belief (or any other mental state) may justify itself; it holds that an appearance may justify a belief. Provided that no appearance is a belief, this view avoids the most obviously objectionable form of circularity, and it avoids the Foley counterexample. Suppose that S has almost enough justification to believe that P, and then, in addition, S acquires an appearance that P. Assume also that S has no defeaters for a belief in P. In this case, it is not counterintuitive to hold that S would then be justified in believing that P.

2. The Nature of Appearance

Phenomenal conservatism ascribes justificatory significance to appearances. But what are appearances? Philosophers have taken a number of different views about the nature of appearances, and which view one takes may dramatically affect the plausibility of PC. In this section, we consider some views philosophers have taken about what it is for it to “seem to one that P.”

a. The Belief that P

Here is a very simple theory: to say that it seems to one that P is to report a tentative sort of belief that P (Chisholm [1957, ch. 4] suggested something in this neighborhood). This, however, is not how “seems” is understood by phenomenal conservatives when they state that if it seems to one that P and one lacks defeaters for P, then one has justification for P.

To motivate the distinction between its seeming to one that P and one’s believing that P, notice that in some cases, it seems to one that P even though one does not believe that P. For instance, when one experiences perceptual illusions, the illusions typically persist even when one learns that they are illusions. That is to say, things continue to appear a certain way even when one does not believe that things are as they appear, indeed, even when one knows that things are not as they appear. This shows that an appearance that P is not a belief that P.

b. The Disposition to Believe that P

Some thinkers suggest that an appearance that P might be identified with a mere inclination or disposition to believe that P (Sosa 1998, pp. 258-9; Swinburne 2001, pp. 141-2; Armstrong 1961). Typically, when it appears to one that P, one will be disposed to believe that P. However, one may be disposed to believe that P when it doesn’t seem to one that P. For instance, if one is inclined to believe that P merely because one wants P to be true, or because one thinks that a virtuous person would believe that P, this would not be a case in which it seems to one that P. Even in cases where it seems to one that P, its seeming to one that P is not to be identified with the disposition to believe that P, since one is disposed to believe that P because it seems to one that P, and not the other way around. Thus, its seeming to one that P is merely one possible ground for the disposition to believe that P.

c. The Belief that One Has Evidence for P

Some philosophers hold that its seeming to one that P is a matter of one’s believing, or being disposed to believe, that some mental state one has is evidence for P (Conee 2013; Tooley 2013). This would undermine the plausibility of PC, since it is not very plausible to think that one’s merely being disposed to believe (whether rightly or wrongly) that one has evidence for P actually gives one justification for believing P.

Fortunately, phenomenal conservatives can reasonably reject that sort of analysis, on grounds similar to those used to reject the idea that its seeming to one that P is just a matter of one’s being disposed to believe that P. Suppose that Jon is disposed to believe that he has evidence for the reality of life after death merely because Jon wants it to be true that he has evidence for life after death (a case of pure wishful thinking). This surely would not count as its seeming to Jon that there is life after death.

d. The Experience View

Most phenomenal conservatives hold that its seeming to one that P is a matter of one’s having a certain sort of experience, which has propositional content but is not analyzable in terms of belief (for discussion, see Tucker 2013, section 1). Sensory experiences, intellectual intuitions, (apparent) memories, and introspective states are either species of this broad type of experience, or else states that contain an appearance as a component.

Some philosophers have questioned this view of appearance, on the ground that intellectual intuitions, perceptual experiences, memories, and episodes of self-awareness are extremely different mental states that have nothing interesting in common (DePaul 2009, pp. 208-9).

In response, one can observe that intuitions, perceptual experiences, memories, and states of self-awareness are all mental states of a kind that naturally incline one to believe something (namely, the content of that very mental state, or, the thing that appears to one to be the case). And it is not merely that one is inclined to believe that proposition for some reason or other. We can distinguish many different reasons why one might be inclined to believe P: because one wants P to be true, because one thinks a good person would believe P, because one wants to fit in with the other people who believe P, because being a P-believer will annoy one’s parents . . . or because P just seems to one to be the case. When we reflect on these various ways of being disposed to believe P, we can see that the last one is interestingly different from all the others and forms a distinct (non-disjunctive) category. Admittedly, I have not just identified a new characteristic or set of characteristics that all and only appearances have in common; I have not defined “appearance”, and I do not believe it is possible to do so. What I have done, I hope, is simply to draw attention to the commonality among all appearances by contrasting appearances with various other things that tend to produce beliefs. When Jon believes [for all numbers x and y, x+y = y+x] because that proposition is intuitively obvious, and Mary believes [the cat is on the couch] because she seems to see the cat on the couch, these two situations are similar to each other in an interesting respect – which we see when we contrast both of those cases with cases such as that in which Sally thinks her son was wrongly convicted because Sally just cannot bear the thought that her son is a criminal (Huemer 2009, pp. 228-9).

e. Appearance versus Acquaintance

Appearances should be distinguished from another sort of non-doxastic mental state sometimes held to provide foundational justification for beliefs, namely, the state of acquaintance (Russell 1997, chs. 5, 9; Fumerton 1995, pp. 73-9). Acquaintance is a form of direct awareness of something. States of acquaintance differ from appearances in that the occurrence of an episode of acquaintance entails the existence of an object with which the subject is acquainted, whereas an appearance can occur without there being any object that appears. For example, if a person has a fully realistic hallucination of a pink rat, we can say that the person experiences an appearance of a pink rat, but we cannot say the person is acquainted with a pink rat, since there is no pink rat with which to be acquainted. In other words, an appearance is an internal mental representation, whereas acquaintance is a relation to some object.

3. Arguments for Phenomenal Conservatism

a. Intuitive Internalist Motivation

Richard Foley (1993) has advanced a plausible account of rationality, on which, roughly, it is rational for S to do A provided that, from S’s own point of view, doing A would seem to be a reasonably effective way of satisfying S’s goals. Foley goes on to suggest that epistemic rationality is rationality from the standpoint of the goal of now believing truths and avoiding falsehoods. Though Foley does not draw this consequence, his account of epistemic rationality lends support to PC, for if it seems to S that P is true and S lacks grounds for doubting P, then from S’s own point of view, believing P would naturally seem to be an effective way of furthering S’s goal of believing truths and avoiding falsehoods. Therefore, it seems, it would be epistemically rational for S to believe that P (Huemer 2001, pp. 103-4; compare McGrath 2013, section 1).

b. An Internal Coherence Argument

Internalism in epistemology is, roughly, the view that the justification or lack of justification of a belief is entirely a function of the internal mental states of the believer (for a fuller account, see Fumerton 1995, pp. 60-9). Externalism, by contrast, holds that a belief’s status as justified or unjustified sometimes depends upon factors outside the subject’s mind.

The following is one sort of argument for internalism and against externalism. Suppose that externalism is true, and that the justification of a belief depends upon some external factor, E. There could be two propositions, P and Q, that appear to one exactly alike in all epistemically relevant respects—for instance, P and Q appear equally true, equally justified, and equally supported by reliable belief-forming processes; however, it might be that P is justified and Q unjustified, because P but not Q possesses E. Since E is an external factor, this need have no impact whatsoever on how anything appears to the subject. If such a situation occurred, the externalist would presumably say that one ought to believe that P, while at the same time either denying Q or withholding judgment concerning Q.

But if one took this combination of attitudes, it seems that one could have no coherent understanding of what one was doing. Upon reflecting on one’s own state of mind, one would have to hold something like this: “P and Q seem to me equally correct, equally justified, and in every other respect equally worthy of belief. Nevertheless, while I believe P, I refuse to believe Q, for no apparent reason.” But this seems to be an irrational set of attitudes to hold. Therefore, we ought to reject the initial externalist assumption, namely, that the justificatory status of P and Q depends on E.

If one accepts this sort of motivation for internalism, then it is plausible to draw a further conclusion. Not only does the justificatory status of a belief depend upon the subject’s internal mental states; it depends, more specifically, on the subject’s appearances (that is, on how things seem to the subject). On this view, it is impossible for P and Q to seem the same to one in all relevant respects and yet for P to be justified and Q unjustified. This is best explained by something like PC (Huemer 2006).

c. The Self-Defeat Argument

One controversial argument claims that PC is the only theory of epistemic justification that is not self-defeating (Huemer 2007; Skene 2013). The first premise of this argument is that all relevant beliefs (all beliefs that are plausible candidates for being doxastically justified) are based on appearances. I think there is a table in front of me because it appears that way. I think three plus three is six because that seems true to me. And so on. There are cases of beliefs not based on how things seem, but these are not plausible candidates for justified beliefs to begin with. For instance, I might believe that there is life after death, not because this seems true but because I want it to be true (wishful thinking) – but this would not be a plausible candidate for a justified belief.

The second premise is that a belief is doxastically justified only if what it is based on is a source of propositional justification. Intuitively, my belief is justified only if I not only have justification for it but also believe it because of that justification.

From here, one can infer that unless appearances are a source of propositional justification, no belief is justified, including the belief that appearances are not a source of propositional justification. Therefore, to deny that appearances are a source of propositional justification would be self-defeating. Huemer (2007) interprets this to mean that the mere fact that something appears to one to be the case must (in the absence of defeaters) suffice to confer justification. Some critics maintain, however, that one need only hold that some appearances generate justification, allowing that perhaps other appearances fail to generate justification even in the absence of defeaters (BonJour 2004, p. 359).

A related objection holds that there may be “background conditions” for a belief’s justification – conditions that enable an appearance to provide justification for a belief but which are not themselves part of the belief’s justification. Thus, PC might be false, not because appearances fail to constitute a source of justification, but because they only do so in the presence of these background conditions, which PC neglects to mention. And these background conditions need not themselves be causally related to one’s belief in order for one’s belief to be doxastically justified. (For this objection, see Markie 2013, section 2; for a reply, see Huemer 2013b, section 4.)

Other critics hold that the first premise of the self-defeat argument is mistaken, because it often happens that one justifiedly believes some conclusion on the basis of an inference from other (justified) beliefs, where the conclusion of the inference does not itself seem true; hence, one can be justified in believing P without basing that belief on a seeming that P (Conee 2013, pp. 64-5). In reply, the first premise of the self-defeat argument need not be read as holding that the belief that P (in relevant cases) is always based on an appearance that P. It might be held that the belief that P (in relevant cases) is always based either on the appearance that P or on some ultimate premises which are themselves believed because they seem correct.

d. Avoiding Skepticism

Skeptics in epistemology maintain that we don’t know nearly as much as we think we do. There are a variety of forms of skepticism. For instance, external world skeptics hold that no one knows any contingent propositions about the external world (the world outside one’s own mind). These skeptics argue that to know anything about the external world, one would need to be able to figure out what the external world is likely solely on the basis of facts about one’s own experiences, but that in fact nothing can be legitimately inferred about non-experiential reality solely from one’s own experiences (Hume 1975, section XII, part 1). Most epistemologists consider this conclusion to be implausible on its face, even absurd, so they have sought ways of rebutting the skeptic’s arguments. However, rebutting skeptical arguments has proved very difficult, and there is no generally accepted refutation of external world skepticism.

Another form of skepticism is moral skepticism, the view that no one knows any substantive evaluative propositions. On this view, no one ever knows that any action is wrong, that any event is good, that any person is vicious or virtuous. Again, this idea seems implausible on its face, but philosophers have found it difficult to explain how, in general, someone can know what is right, wrong, good, or bad. Skeptical views may also be held in a variety of other areas – skeptics may challenge our knowledge of the past, of other people’s minds, or of all things not presently observed. As a rule, epistemologists seek to avoid skeptical conclusions, yet it is often difficult to do so plausibly.

Enter phenomenal conservatism. Once one accepts something in the neighborhood of PC, most if not all skeptical worries are easily resolved. External world skepticism is addressed by noting that, when we have perceptual experiences, there seem to us to be external objects of various sorts around us. In the absence of defeaters, this is good reason to think there are in fact such objects (Huemer 2001). Moral skepticism is dealt with in a similarly straightforward manner. When we think about certain kinds of situations, our ethical intuitions show us what is right, wrong, good, or bad. For instance, when we think about pushing a man in front of a moving train, the action seems wrong. In the absence of defeaters, this is good enough reason to think that pushing the man in front of the train would be wrong (Huemer 2005). Similar observations apply to most if not all forms of skepticism. Thus, the ability to avoid skepticism, long considered an elusive desideratum of epistemological theories, is among the great theoretical advantages of phenomenal conservatism.

e. Simplicity

If we accept phenomenal conservatism, we have a single, simple principle to account for the justification of multiple very different kinds of belief, including perceptual beliefs, moral beliefs, mathematical beliefs, memory beliefs, beliefs about one’s own mind, beliefs about other minds, and so on. One may even be able to unify inferential and non-inferential justification (Huemer 2013b, pp. 338-41). To the extent that simplicity and unity are theoretical virtues, then, we have grounds for embracing PC. There is probably no other (plausible) theory that can account for so many justified beliefs in anything like such a simple manner.

4. Objections

a. Crazy Appearances

Some critics have worried that phenomenal conservatism commits us to saying that all sorts of crazy propositions could be non-inferentially justified. Suppose that when I see a certain walnut tree, it just seems to me that the tree was planted on April 24, 1914 (this example is from Markie 2005, p. 357). This seeming comes completely out of the blue, unrelated to anything else about my experience – there is no date-of-planting sign on the tree, for example; I am just suffering from a brain malfunction. If PC is true, then as long as I have no reason to doubt my experience, I have some justification for believing that the tree was planted on that date.

More ominously, suppose that it just seems to me that a certain religion is true, and that I should kill anyone who does not subscribe to the one true religion. I have no evidence either for or against these propositions other than that they just seem true to me (this example is from Tooley 2013, section 5.1.2). If PC is true, then I would be justified (to some degree) in thinking that I should kill everyone who fails to subscribe to the “true” religion. And perhaps I would then be morally justified in actually trying to kill these “infidels” (as Littlejohn [2011] worries).

Phenomenal conservatives are likely to bravely embrace the possibility of justified beliefs in “crazy” (to us) propositions, while adding a few comments to reduce the shock of doing so. To begin with, any actual person with anything like normal background knowledge and experience would in fact have defeaters for the beliefs mentioned in these examples (people can’t normally tell when a tree was planted by looking at it; there are many conflicting religions; religious beliefs tend to be determined by one’s upbringing; and so on).

We could try to imagine cases in which the subjects had no such background information. This, however, would render the scenarios even more strange than they already are. And this is a problem for two reasons. First, it is very difficult to vividly imagine these scenarios. Markie’s walnut tree scenario is particularly hard to imagine – what is it like to have an experience of a tree’s seeming to have been planted on April 24, 1914? Is it even possible for a human being to have such an experience? The difficulty of vividly imagining a scenario should undermine our confidence in any reported intuitions about that scenario.

The second problem is that our intuitions about strange scenarios may be influenced by what we reasonably believe about superficially similar but more realistic scenarios. We are particularly unlikely to have reliable intuitions about a scenario S when (i) we never encounter or think about S in normal life, (ii) S is superficially similar to another scenario, S', which we encounter or think about quite a bit, and (iii) the correct judgment about S' is different from the correct judgment about S. For instance, in the actual world, people who think they should kill infidels are highly irrational in general and extremely unjustified in that belief in particular. It is not hard to see how this would incline us to say that the characters in Tooley’s and Littlejohn’s examples are also irrational. That is, even if PC were true, it seems likely that a fair number of people would report the intuition that the hypothetical religious fanatics are unjustified.

A further observation relevant to the religious example is that the practical consequences of a belief may impact the degree of epistemic justification that one needs in order to be justified in acting on the belief, such that a belief with extremely serious practical consequences may call for a higher degree of justification and a stronger effort at investigation than would be the case for a belief with less serious consequences. PC only speaks of one’s having some justification for believing P; it does not entail that this is a sufficient degree of justification for taking action based on P.

b. Metajustification

Some argue that its merely seeming to one that P cannot suffice (even in the absence of defeaters) to confer justification for believing P; in addition, one must have some reason for thinking that one’s appearances are reliable indicators of the truth, or that things that appear to one to be the case are likely to actually be the case (BonJour 2004, pp. 357-60; Steup 2013). Otherwise, one would have to regard it as at best an accident that one managed to get to the truth regarding whether P. We can refer to this alleged requirement on justified belief as the “metajustification requirement”. (When one has an alleged justification for P, a “metajustification” is a justification for thinking that one’s alleged justification for P actually renders P likely to be true [BonJour 1985, p. 9].)

While perhaps superficially plausible, the metajustification requirement threatens us with skepticism. To begin with, if we think that appearance-based justifications require metajustifications (to wit, evidence that appearances are reliable indicators of the truth), it is unclear why we should not impose the same requirement on all justifications of any kind. That is, where someone claims that belief in P is justified because of some state of affairs X, we could always demand a justification for thinking that X – whatever it is – is a reliable indicator of the truth of P. And suppose X' explains why we are justified in thinking that X is a reliable indicator of the truth of P. Then we’ll need a reason for thinking that X' is a reliable indicator of X’s being a reliable indicator of the truth of P. And so on, ad infinitum.

One can avoid this sort of infinite regress by rejecting any general metajustification requirement. The phenomenal conservative will most likely want to maintain that one need not have positive grounds for thinking one’s appearances to be reliable; one is simply entitled to rely upon them unless and until one acquires grounds for doubting that they are reliable.

c. Cognitive Penetration and Tainted Sources

Another class of objection to PC adverts to cases of appearances that are produced by emotions, desires, irrational beliefs, or other kinds of sources that would normally render a belief unjustified (Markie 2006, pp. 119-20; Lyons 2011; Siegel 2013; McGrath 2013). That is, where a belief produced by a particular source X would be unjustified, the objector contends that an appearance produced by X should not be counted as conferring justification either (even if the subject does not know that the appearance has this source).

Suppose, for instance, that Jill, for no good reason, thinks that Jack is angry (this example is from Siegel 2013). This is an unjustified belief. If Jill infers further conclusions from the belief that Jack is angry, these conclusions will also be unjustified. But now suppose that Jill’s belief that Jack is angry causes Jill to see Jack’s facial expression as one of anger. This “seeing as” is not a belief but a kind of experience – that is, Jack’s face just looks to Jill like an angry face. This is, however, a misinterpretation on Jill’s part, and an ordinary observer, without any preexisting beliefs about Jack’s emotional state, would not see Jack as looking angry. But Jill is not aware that her perception has been influenced by her belief in this way, nor has she any other defeaters for the proposition that Jack is angry. If PC is true, Jill will now have justification for believing that Jack is angry, arising directly from the mere appearance of Jack’s being angry. Some find this result counter-intuitive, since it allows an initially unjustified belief to indirectly generate justification for itself.

Phenomenal conservatives try to explain away this intuition. Skene (2013, section 5.1) suggests that the objectors may confuse the evaluation of the belief with that of the person who holds the belief in the sort of example described above, and that the person should be adjudged irrational but her belief judged rational. Tucker (2010, p. 540) suggests that the person possesses justification but lacks another requirement for knowledge and is epistemically blameworthy (compare Huemer 2013a, pp. 747-8). Huemer (2013b, pp. 343-5) argues that the subject has a justified belief in this sort of case by appealing to an analogy involving a subject who has a hallucination caused (unbeknownst to the subject) by the subject’s own prior action.

d. Inferential Justification

Suppose S bases a belief in some proposition P on (his belief in) some evidence E. Suppose that the inference from E to P is fallacious, such that E in fact provides no support at all for P (E neither entails P nor raises the probability of P). S, however, incorrectly perceives E as supporting P, and thus, S’s belief in E makes it seem to S that P must be true as well. (It does not independently seem to S that P is true; it just seems to S that P must be true given E.) Finally, assume that S has no reason for thinking that the inference is fallacious, even though it is, nor has S any other defeaters for P. It seems that such a scenario is possible. If so, one can raise the following objection to PC:

1. In the described scenario, S is not justified in believing P.

2. If PC is true, then in this scenario, S is justified in believing P.

3. So PC is false.

Many would accept premise (1), holding that an inferential belief is unjustified whenever the inference on which the belief is based is fallacious. (2) is true, since in the described scenario, it seems to S that P, while S has no defeaters for P. (For an objection along these lines, see Tooley 2013, p. 323.)

One possible response to this objection would be to restrict the principle of phenomenal conservatism to the case of non-inferential beliefs and to hold a different view (perhaps some variation on PC) of the conditions for inferential beliefs to be justified.

Another alternative is to maintain that in fact, fallacious inferences can result in justified belief. Of course, if a person has reason to believe that the inference on which he bases a given belief is fallacious, then this will constitute a defeater for that belief. It is consistent with phenomenal conservatism that the belief will be unjustified in this case. So the only cases that might pose a problem are those in which a subject makes an inference that is in fact fallacious but that seems perfectly good to him, and he has no reason to suspect that the inference is fallacious or otherwise defective. In such a case, one could argue that the subject rationally ought to accept the conclusion. If the subject refused to accept the conclusion, how could he rationally explain this refusal? He could not cite the fact that the inference is fallacious, nor could he point to any relevant defect in the inference, since by stipulation, as far as he can tell the inference is perfectly good. Given this, it would seem irrational for the subject not to accept the conclusion (Huemer 2013b, p. 339).

Here is another proposed condition on doxastic justification: if S believes P on the basis of E, then S is justified in believing P only if S is justified in believing E. This condition is very widely accepted. But again, PC seems to flout this requirement, since all that is needed is for S’s belief in E to cause it to seem to S that P (while S lacks defeaters for P), which might happen even if S’s belief in E is unjustified (McGrath 2013, section 5; Markie 2013, section 2).

A phenomenal conservative might try to avoid this sort of counterexample by claiming that whenever S believes P on the basis of E and E is unjustified, S has a defeater for P. This might be true because (i) per epistemological internalism, whenever E is unjustified, the subject has justification for believing that E is unjustified, (ii) whenever S’s belief that P is based on E, the subject has justification for believing that his belief that P is based on E, and (iii) the fact that one’s belief that P is based on an unjustified premise would be an undercutting defeater for the belief that P.

Alternately, and perhaps more naturally, the phenomenal conservative might again restrict the scope of PC to noninferential beliefs, while holding a different (but perhaps closely related) view about the justification of inferential beliefs (McGrath 2013, section 5; Tooley 2013, section 5.2.1). For instance, one might think that in the case of a non-inferential belief, justification requires only that the belief’s content seem true and that the subject lack defeaters for the belief; but that in the case of an inferential belief, justification requires that the premise be justifiedly believed, that the premise seem to support the conclusion, and that the subject lack defeaters for the conclusion (Huemer 2013b, p. 338).

5. Summary

Among the most central, fundamental questions of epistemology is that of what, in general, justifies a belief. Phenomenal Conservatism is among the major theoretical answers to this question: at bottom, beliefs are justified by “appearances,” which are a special type of experience one reports when one says “it seems to me that P” or “it appears to me that P.” This position is widely viewed as possessing important theoretical virtues, including the ability to offer a very simple account of many kinds of justified belief while avoiding troublesome forms of philosophical skepticism. Some proponents lay claim to more controversial advantages for the theory, such as the unique ability to avoid self-defeat and to accommodate central internalist intuitions.

The theory remains controversial among epistemologists for a variety of reasons. Some harbor doubts about the reality of a special type of experience called an “appearance.” Others believe that an appearance cannot provide justification unless one first has independent evidence of the reliability of one’s appearances. Others cite alleged counterexamples in which appearances have irrational or otherwise unreliable sources. And others object that phenomenal conservatism seems to flout widely accepted necessary conditions for inferential justification.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, David. 1961. Perception and the Physical World. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • BonJour, Laurence. 1985. The Structure of Empirical Knowledge. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • BonJour, Laurence. 2004. “In Search of Direct Realism.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 69, 349-367.
    • Early objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Brogaard, Berit. 2013. “Phenomenal Seemings and Sensible Dogmatism.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 270-289). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. 1957. Perceiving: A Philosophical Study. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
    • Chapter 4 offers a widely cited discussion of three uses of “appears” and related terms.
  • Conee, Earl. 2013. “Seeming Evidence.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 52-68). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Cullison, Andrew. 2010. “What Are Seemings?” Ratio 23, 260-274.
  • DePaul, Michael. 2009. “Phenomenal Conservatism and Self-Defeat.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 78, 205-212.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism, especially the self-defeat argument.
  • DePoe, John. 2011. “Defeating the Self-defeat Argument for Phenomenal Conservativism.” Philosophical Studies 152, 347–359.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism, especially the self-defeat argument.
  • Foley, Richard. 1983. “Epistemic Conservatism.” Philosophical Studies 43, 165-182.
    • Objections to doxastic conservatism.
  • Foley, Richard. 1993. Working without a Net. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Fumerton, Richard. 1995. Metaepistemology and Skepticism. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Hanna, Nathan. 2011. “Against Phenomenal Conservatism.” Acta Analytica 26, 213-221.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2001. Skepticism and the Veil of Perception. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
    • Chapter 5 defends phenomenal conservatism and contains a version of the self-defeat argument. This is the original source of the term “phenomenal conservatism.”
  • Huemer, Michael. 2005. Ethical Intuitionism. New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
    • Chapter 5 uses phenomenal conservatism to explain moral knowledge.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2006. “Phenomenal Conservatism and the Internalist Intuition.” American Philosophical Quarterly 43, 147-158.
    • Defends phenomenal conservatism using internalist intuitions.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2007. “Compassionate Phenomenal Conservatism.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 74, 30-55.
    • Defends phenomenal conservatism using the self-defeat argument. Responds to BonJour 2004.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2009. “Apology of a Modest Intuitionist.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 78, 222-236.
    • Responds to DePaul 2009.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2013a. “Epistemological Asymmetries Between Belief and Experience.” Philosophical Studies 162, 741-748.
    • Responds to Siegel 2013.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2013b. “Phenomenal Conservatism Uber Alles.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 328-350). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Responds to several critiques of phenomenal conservatism found in the same volume.
  • Hume, David. 1975. “An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding.” In L. A. Selby-Bigge (ed.), Enquiries Concerning Human Understanding and Concerning the Principles of Morals. Oxford: Clarendon.
  • Littlejohn, Clayton. 2011. “Defeating Phenomenal Conservatism.” Analytic Philosophy 52, 35-48.
    • Argues that PC may lead one to endorse terrorism and cannibalism.
  • Lycan, William. 2013. “Phenomenal Conservatism and the Principle of Credulity.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 293-305). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lyons, Jack. 2011. “Circularity, Reliability, and the Cognitive Penetrability of Perception.” Philosophical Issues 21, 289-311.
  • Markie, Peter. 2005. “The Mystery of Direct Perceptual Justification.” Philosophical Studies 126, 347-373.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Markie, Peter. 2006. “Epistemically Appropriate Perceptual Belief.” Noûs 40, 118-142.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Markie, Peter. 2013. “Searching for True Dogmatism.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 248-268). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • McGrath, Matthew. 2013. “Phenomenal Conservatism and Cognitive Penetration: The ‘Bad Basis’ Counterexamples.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 225-247). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Uses the cognitive penetration counterexamples to motivate a modification of phenomenal conservatism.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1997. The Problems of Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Siegel, Susanna. 2013. “The Epistemic Impact of the Etiology of Experience.” Philosophical Studies 162, 697-722.
    • Criticizes phenomenal conservatism and related views using the tainted source objection.
  • Skene, Matthew. 2013. “Seemings and the Possibility of Epistemic Justification.” Philosophical Studies 163, 539-559.
    • Defends the self-defeat argument for phenomenal conservatism and offers an account of why epistemic justification must derive from appearances.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 1998. “Minimal Intuition.” In Michael DePaul and William Ramsey (eds.), Rethinking Intuition (pp. 257-270). Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Steup, Matthias. 2013. “Does Phenomenal Conservatism Solve Internalism’s Dilemma?” In Chris Tucker (eds.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 135-153). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 2001. Epistemic Justification. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Tolhurst, William. 1998. “Seemings.” American Philosophical Quarterly 35, 293-302.
    • Discusses the nature of seemings.
  • Tooley, Michael. 2013. “Michael Huemer and the Principle of Phenomenal Conservatism.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 306-327). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Tucker, Chris. 2010. “Why Open-Minded People Should Endorse Dogmatism.” Philosophical Perspectives 24, 529-545.
    • Defends phenomenal conservatism, appealing to its explanatory power.
  • Tucker, Chris. 2013. “Seemings and Justification: An Introduction.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 1-29). Oxford: Oxford University Press.


Author Information

Michael Huemer
University of Colorado
U. S. A.

Francis Hutcheson (1694—1745)

Francis HutchesonFrancis Hutcheson was an eighteenth-century Scottish philosopher whose meticulous writings and activities influenced life in Scotland, Great Britain, Europe, and even the newly formed North American colonies. For historians and political scientists, the emphasis has been on his theories of liberalism and political rights; for philosophers and psychologists, Hutcheson’s importance comes from his theories of human nature, which include an account of an innate care and concern for others and of the internal senses (including the moral sense). The latter were pivotal to the Scottish Enlightenment’s empirical aesthetics, and all of Hutcheson’s theories were important to moral sentimentalism. One cannot properly study the works of Adam Smith, Hutcheson’s most famous student, or David Hume’s moral and political theories, without first understanding Hutcheson’s contributions and influence.

Popular and well-read in his day, Hutcheson’s writings seem to be enjoying resurgence specifically among libertarians, contemporary moral psychologists and philosophers. The latter are taking another and more in-depth look at Hutcheson and the rest of the sentimentalists because present-day empirical studies seem to support many of their claims about human nature. This is not surprising because the philosophical theories of the Scottish Enlightenment were based on human observations and experiences, much of which would be considered psychology today.

As part of his attempt to defend Shaftesbury against the attacks of Bernard Mandeville, Hutcheson's writings concentrate on human nature. Hutcheson also promoted a natural benevolence against the egoism of Thomas Hobbes and against the reward/punishment view of Samuel Pufendorf by appealing to our own experiences of ourselves and others.

What follows is an overview of Hutcheson’s life, works and influence, with special attention paid to his writings on aesthetics, morality, and the importance of the internal senses of beauty, harmony, and the moral sense.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Internal Senses
  3. Moral Sense Faculty
    1. Operations of moral sense faculty
    2. Sense vs. Reason
    3. Basis of Moral Determinations
  4. Benevolence: Response to Hobbes and Pufendorf
  5. Influences on Hume and Smith
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Hutcheson
      1. Collected Works and Correspondence
    2. Secondary Readings

1. Life

Francis Hutcheson was born to Scottish parents on August 8, 1694 in Ireland. Though remembered primarily as a philosopher, he was also a Presbyterian minister, as were his father and grandfather before him. After he attended the University of Glasgow in Scotland in 1711 he returned to Dublin in 1716. Rather than taking a ministry position he was asked to start an academy in Dublin, and it was here that he wrote his most influential works. At this time he also married Mary Wilson and had one son, Francis. Eventually he was appointed professor and chair of Moral Philosophy at the University of Glasgow in 1729 following the death of his mentor and teacher, Gershom Carmichael.

Hutcheson was a popular lecturer perhaps because he was the first professor to use English in lectures rather than the commonly used Latin and also, possibly influenced by his preaching experience, was more animated than was typical of an eighteenth-century academic. Throughout his career he retained a commitment to the liberal arts as his thoughts and theories were always connected to the ancient traditions, especially those of Aristotle and Cicero. His writings were respected even before his Glasgow position and this reputation continued throughout his lifetime. His most influential pieces, first published in Dublin anonymously, were An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue (1725) and An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections, with Illustrations of the Moral Sense (1728). Hutcheson’s moral theory was influenced most by Lord Shaftesbury, while his aesthetics were in many ways influenced by and a response to John Locke’s primary and secondary qualities. Those who read and were influenced by Hutcheson’s theories included David Hume and Adam Smith, his student at Glasgow, while Thomas Reid and Immanuel Kant both cited Hutcheson in their writings.

Francis Hutcheson died in 1745 after 16 years at Glasgow while on a visit to Ireland, where he is buried.  After his death, his son and namesake published another edition of Hutcheson’s Illustrations on the Moral Sense in 1746 and in 1755, A System of Moral Philosophy, a text written specifically for college students.

2. Internal Senses

Though Shaftesbury could be called the father of modern aesthetics, Hutcheson’s thorough treatment of the internal senses, especially of beauty, grandeur, harmony, novelty, order and design in the Inquiry, is what specifically moved the focus of study from rational explanations to the sensations. For Hutcheson the perception of beauty does depend on the external sense of sight; however, the internal sense of beauty operates as an internal or reflex sense. The same is the case with hearing: hearing music does not necessarily give the perception of harmony as it is distinct from the hearing (Inquiry I. I. X). Yet, the internal senses are senses because like the external senses they are immediate perceptions not needing knowledge of cause or advantage to receive the idea of beauty. Both the external and internal senses are characterized by a passive and involuntary nature, and the internal senses are a source of pleasure and pain. With a nod to Locke’s primary and secondary qualities (Inquiry I, 1 7), Hutcheson described perception specifically of beauty and harmony in terms of simple and complex ideas. Without the internal sense of beauty there is no perception of it: “This superior power of perception is justly called a sense, because of its affinity to the other senses in this, that the pleasure does not arise from any knowledge of principles, proportions, causes, or of the usefulness of the object; but strikes us at first with the idea of beauty: nor does the most accurate knowledge increase this pleasure of beauty, however it may super-add a distinct rational pleasure from prospects of advantage, or from the increase of knowledge” (Inquiry I, 1, 8).

The perception of beauty though excited by an object is not possible without this internal sense of beauty. There is a specific type of absolute beauty and there are figures that excite this idea of beauty. We experience this when recognizing what Hutcheson calls “uniformity amidst variety” (Inquiry, I, 2, 3). This happens with both mathematical and natural objects, which although multifaceted and complex, are perceived with a distinct uniformity. The proportions of an animal or human figure can also excite and touch the internal sense as absolute beauty. Imitative beauty, on the other hand, is perceived in comparison to something else or as an imitation in art, poetry, or even in an idea. The comparison is what excites this sense of beauty even when the original being imitated is not singularly beautiful.

Hutcheson wondered why there would be a question about whether there were internal senses since they, like the external ones, are prominent in our own experiences. Perhaps one of the reasons that the internal senses are questioned more than the external is because there are no common names for them such as ‘hearing’ and ‘seeing’ (Inquiry, I. VI, IX). There is no easy way to describe the sense that feels beauty, yet we all experience it in the presence of beauty. Though this internal sense can be influenced by knowledge and experience it is not consciously controlled and is involuntary. Moving aesthetics away from logic and mathematical truths does not make it any less real and important for our pleasure as felt in the appreciation and experience of beauty and harmony. The internal senses also include the moral sense, so called by Shaftesbury and developed thoroughly by Hutcheson.

3. Moral Sense Faculty

a. Operations of moral sense faculty

Hutcheson, like Shaftesbury, claimed moral judgments were made in the human faculty that Shaftesbury called a moral sense. Both believed human nature contained all it needed to make moral decisions, along with inclinations to be moral.

The process, Hutcheson described, begins with a feeling of pleasure or advantage felt in the moral sense faculty—not necessarily to us but advantageous to someone or generally for everyone. This perception of pleasure has a specific moral flavor and causes us to feel moral approbation. We feel this pleasure when considering what is good or beneficial to others as a part of our natural instinct of benevolence. The things pursued for this pleasure are wanted because of our self-love and interest in the good for others. So first there is a sense of pleasure; then there is the interest in what causes the pleasure. From there, our experience or reason can tell us what objects have and may continue to give us pleasure or advantage (Hutcheson 1725, 70). For Hutcheson, the moral sense thus described is from God, implanted, not like innate ideas, but as an innate sense of pleasure for objects that are not necessarily to our advantage—and for nobler pleasures like caring for others or appreciation of harmony (Hutcheson 1725, I.VIII, 83).

Evaluating what is good or not—what we morally approve of or disapprove of—is done by this moral sense. The moral sense is not the basis of moral decisions or the justification of our disapproval as the rationalists claim; instead it is better explained as the faculty with which we feel the value of an action. It does not justify our evaluation; the moral sense gives us our evaluation. The moral faculty gives us our sense of valuing—not feeling in an emotional sense as that would be something like sadness or joy.  There is feeling, but the feeling is a valuing type of feeling.

Like the other internal senses of beauty and harmony, people are born with a moral sense. We know this because we experience moral feelings of approbation and disapprobation. We do not choose to make moral approvals or disapprovals; they just happen to us and we feel the approvals when they occur. Hutcheson put it this way: “approbation is not what we can voluntarily bring upon ourselves” (Hutcheson 1728, I. 412). He continued that in spite of the fact that it is a pleasurable experience to approve of actions, we cannot just approve of anything or anyone when we want to. Hutcheson gives illustrations of this: for instance, people do not “approve as virtuous the eating a bunch of grapes, taking a glass of wine, or sitting down when tired” (ibid.). The point is that moral approvals and disapprovals done by our moral sense are specific in nature and only operate when there is an action that can be appropriately judged of by our moral sense (ibid.). Another way to make this point is to compare the moral sense to the olfactory sense. I can put my nose to this ceramic cup in front of me but my nose will not smell anything if there is nothing to smell. The moral sense operates when an idea touches it the same way a nose smells when there is an odor reaching it. No odor, no smell; no moral issue, no moral sentiment. For Hutcheson, the moral sense is involved and included when the agent reflects on an action or a spectator observes them in reference to the action’s circumstances, specifically those whom it affects (Hutcheson 1728, I. 408). So when an action has consequences for others, it is more likely to awaken our moral sensibility.

Reasoning and information can change the evaluation of the moral sense, but no amount of reasoning can or does precede the moral sense in regard to its approval of what is for the public good. Reason does, however, inform the moral sense, as discussed below. The moral sense approves of the good for others. This concern for others by the moral sense is what is natural to humankind, Hutcheson contended. Reason gives content to the moral sense, informing it of what is good for others and the public good (Hutcheson 1728, I. 411).

Some may think Hutcheson a utilitarian and certainly no thorough accounting of historical utilitarianism is complete without a mention of Hutcheson. Consider the following statement from Hutcheson: “In the same manner, the moral evil, or vice, is as the degree of misery, and number of sufferers; so that, that action is best, which procures the greatest happiness for the greatest numbers; and that, worst, which, in like manner, occasions, misery.” Preceding this, though, is the phrase, “…we are led by our moral sense of virtue to judge thus…” (Inquiry, II, 3, 8). So it is our moral sense that evaluates goodness and evil and does seem to evaluate much like a utilitarian, but it is not bound by the utilitarian rule—moral sense evaluations are normatively privileged and prior to moral rules of any kind.

In Illustrations upon the Moral Sense (1728), Hutcheson gives definitions of both the approbation of our own actions and those of others. Approbation of our own action is given when we are pleased with ourselves for doing the action and/or pleased with our intentions for doing the action. Hutcheson puts it this way: “[A]pprobation of our own action denotes, or is attended with, a pleasure in the contemplation of it, and in reflection upon the affections which inclined us to it” (I. 403). Consider what happens when someone picks up and returns something that another person drops. In response to the action, the person who picked up the dropped item would have feelings of approbation toward their own action. This person would be happy with what they did, especially after giving it some thought. Further, they would be pleased if their own intentions were ones with which they could also be pleased. The intention could possibly be that they just wanted to help this person; however, if the intention was to gain advantage with the other person, then they would not be as pleased with themselves. Approbation of another’s action is much the same except that the observer is pleased to witness the action of the other person and feels affection toward the agent of the action. Again Hutcheson:

[A]pprobation of the action of another has some little pleasure in attending it in the observer, and raises love toward the agent, in whom the quality approved is deemed to reside, and not in the observer, who has a satisfaction in the act of approving (Hutcheson 1728, 403).

There is a distinction, Hutcheson claimed, between choosing to do an action or wanting someone else to do an action and our approbation of the action. According to Hutcheson, we often act in ways we disapprove of (ibid. 403). All I have to think of is the extra cookie I have just consumed: upon reflection I am not pleased with my choice; I disapprove of eating the cookie.

b. Sense vs. Reason

In response to the difficulty philosophers seem to have understanding the separate operations of sensing—done by the moral sense—and intellectual reasoning, Hutcheson referred to the ancients—a common element in his writing—and the division of the soul between the will (desires, appetites, ‘sensus’) and the intellect. Philosophers who think reasons motivate and/or judge have conflated the will into the intellect (Hutcheson 1728, 405). In this same discussion, Hutcheson, borrowing from Aristotle, explained that reason and the intellect help determine how to reach an end or goal. Yet the desire for that goal is the job of the will. The will is moved by the desire for that end which, of course, for Aristotle, was happiness (ibid. I. 405-6).

There has to be a desire for the will to choose something. Something is chosen because it is seen as a possible fulfillment of a human desire. For Hutcheson, there is a natural instinct and desire for the good of others. Without this natural desire, Hutcheson claimed, no one would care whether an action benefits or harms one person or many. Information may be sound and true about the dangers of an action, yet without the instinct to care about those who would be benefited or harmed the information would not move our passions (ibid. I. 406-7). The only reason to care about a natural disaster 1,000 miles away where we do not know anyone and we are not affected even indirectly is that we care about others in general and do not wish harm on them. A person can only want something if the desire for it is connected to or understood to be satisfying a certain natural instinct or affection (ibid. I. 404). This instinct or desire for the welfare of others is what influences our moral sense to approve or disapprove of an action.

Reasons and discussions that excite and motivate presuppose instincts and affections (ibid.). To be moved means there is an instinct that is moved. Consider a different type of instinct like one’s instinct for happiness. Hutcheson explained it this way: “[T]here is an instinct or desire fixed in his nature, determining him to pursue his happiness: but it is not this reflection on his own nature, or this [some] proposition which excites or determines him, but the instinct itself” (ibid. I. 406). It is not the proposition that a certain act will produce lots of money that excites a person, but rather the instinct toward happiness and the belief that money will bring the desired happiness. So reasoning that leads a person to believe that money will bring happiness presupposes an instinct that values happiness. Reasons that justify or explain something as being moral or immoral presuppose a moral sense (ibid. 404). If there are reasons for something and those reasons are considered, a moral sense must exist that cares about and utilizes the information.

Hutcheson thought one of the reasons there was confusion and opposition to the idea of moral judgment coming from one’s instincts or affections is the violent, passionate actions that are observed in people and would not be effective as moral evaluators. Yet Hutcheson was not claiming that these passions and out-of-control desires are the source of moral judgment; it is “the calm desire or affection which employs our reason freely…” (ibid. IV. 413). Also, for Hutcheson, “the most perfect virtue consists in the calm, impassionate benevolence, rather than in particular affection” (ibid.). So not only are the moral passions calm, they naturally respond positively to behaviors that benefit the public good. Hutcheson did not claim that this should be the case and, therefore, it is not the normative claim utilitarianism makes; rather, what Hutcheson argued is that his experiences and moral sense find this to be the case.

To the criticism that a person’s moral sense might be judged good or evil, Hutcheson replied that this was not possible. He compared judging the moral sense as good or evil with calling the “power of tasting, sweet or bitter; or of seeing, strait or crooked, white or black” (ibid. I. 409). So a person cannot have a morally evil moral sense even if this person disagrees with another. Hutcheson did see that people may differ in taste—and various people could and do—and that the moral sense can be silenced or ignored (ibid. 410). He contended, however, that these differences in taste and evaluation do not indicate evil in the moral sense itself.

Hutcheson did address the issue of uniformity in moral sentiments by answering whether or not we can know others will also approve of that which we approve (ibid. IV. 414). Though there is no certainty of agreement, the moral sense as natural to humankind is largely uniform. Hutcheson added that God approves of benevolence and kindness and so he created human nature with the capability to make the same types of approvals, and this is done by the moral sense. Our moral sense naturally, according to Hutcheson, approves of kindness and caring for others, and unless there is a prejudiced view of whether the action is truly kind and publicly useful, it is not probable that a person would judge incorrectly (ibid.). So, yes, there is disagreement sometimes, but the disagreement is not rooted in self-interest.

c. Basis of Moral Determinations

For Hutcheson, the foundation of our moral determinations is not self-love. What is basic to morality is our inclination for benevolence—an integral part of our moral evaluations which will be more fully examined in the following section. In response to the Hobbesian doctrine of egoism as advanced by authors like Bernard Mandeville, Hutcheson set out to prove the existence of natural feelings like benevolence in order to show that not every action was performed out of self-interest. Although the following quote demonstrates that Hutcheson worried that our natural benevolence could get caught up with our selfish nature, he hoped people could realize that our natural benevolence will allow us to see the higher character and that we can understand and encourage what is best for everyone:

Let the misery of excessive selfishness, and all its passions, be but once explain’d, that so self-love may cease to counteract our natural propensity to benevolence, and when this noble disposition gets loose from these bonds of ignorance, and false views of interest, it shall be assisted even by self-love, and grow strong enough to make a noble virtuous character. Then he is to enquire, by reflection upon human affairs, what course of action does most effectually promote the universal good… (Hutcheson 1725, VII. 155).

However, even when selfishness drowns out our benevolent instincts, our moral sense still operates in response to what is good for others.

Hutcheson’s moral sense theory helped to conceptually circumvent the problems that stem from a strict doctrine of egoism. He claimed that it is natural for us to want good things for others. When someone’s moral sense operates and they judge an action as morally wrong, the moral sense is not why they feel the wrongness, it is how they feel it. It is like an applause meter that evaluates the morality that is expressed in the sentiment: “I morally disapprove of that.” This last statement is a report of the moral sense into an opinion of morality, moving from a feeling to an idea. Yet, if the moral sense faculty works the way Hutcheson describes, there needs to be an innate benevolence, and that case is made by Hutcheson.

4. Benevolence: Response to Hobbes and Pufendorf

Hutcheson’s arguments for an instinctual benevolence are in both Reflections on the Common Systems of Morality (1724) and the Inaugural Lecture on the Nature of Man (1730), both found in Francis Hutcheson: Two Texts on Human Nature (Mautner 1993). In these texts Hutcheson responds to both Thomas Hobbes and Samuel Pufendorf, arguing that from our own experiences we can see that there are, in fact, disinterested motivations common in humankind. Hutcheson specifically claims that the term ‘state of nature’ as used by Hobbes and Pufendorf creates a misunderstanding of what is actually present in human nature. The actual ‘state of nature,’ for Hutcheson, includes the benevolence he claimed as instinctual to humankind. The particular Pufendorf claim that Hutcheson was concerned with was that people would not be virtuous unless they believed in divine punishment and reward (Mautner 1993, 18). This is not unlike Hobbes, who claimed that without civil authority, life for humankind would be “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish and short” (Hobbes 1651, 13.8). For both Hobbes and Pufendorf, the natural ‘state of nature’ is unappealing and full of egoistic defensive protections against others. In opposition, Hutcheson claims the nature of humankind as created by God includes a natural instinct for benevolence. Hutcheson considered the state of nature as described by Hobbes and Pufendorf as an uncultivated state (Hutcheson 1730, 132). He described the cultivated state as one in which a person’s mind is actively learning and developing. These cultivated persons are, for Hutcheson, truly following their own nature as designed by God. In this cultivated state, persons take care of themselves and want all of humankind to be safe and sound (Hutcheson 1730, 133). Hutcheson would have preferred that Hobbes and Pufendorf had used a term other than ‘state of nature’—perhaps ‘state of freedom’—to describe the uncultivated state. This may seem like an unimportant distinction, but consider it for a moment: if humankind is naturally as Hobbes and Pufendorf described, then they need to be forced to develop in cooperative ways, which would be against their nature. If humankind were by nature caring of others, as Hutcheson proposed, then individuals would not need to be forced to cooperate.

Besides the label, ‘state of nature,’ Hutcheson had other objections to the negative characterization of humankind ascribed by Pufendorf and Hobbes. Surely we experience other aspects of people that are not cruel or selfish. We also experience in ourselves a caring and a concern for others. Hutcheson wondered why there was no attention or acknowledgement given by Hobbes or Pufendorf to people’s natural propensity and:

kind instinct [s] to associate; of natural affections, of compassion, of love of company, a sense of gratitude, a determination to honour and love the authors of any good offices toward any part of mankind, as well as of those toward our selves… (Hutcheson 1724, 100).

These characteristics, for Hutcheson, are certainly a part of what we experience in ourselves and in others. We reach out to people for friendship and are impressed and grateful to people who kindly help others as well as ourselves.

Hutcheson also added that human beings naturally care what others think of them. He described this characteristic, observed in others and experienced in ourselves, as “a natural delight men take in being esteemed and honoured by others for good actions…” These characteristics, “all may be observed to prevail exceedingly in humane life,” are ones that we witness daily in people, and are ignored and therefore unaccounted for by Hobbes and Pufendorf (Hutcheson 1724, 100-1). Here, Hutcheson took care to describe his own experiences, and those of others for whom caring for others is not uncommon, and yet these characteristics are missing in the Hobbesian model of humankind. And it is not a meek or quiet instinct: “we shall find one of the greatest springs of their [men in general] actions to be love toward others…a strong delight in being honoured by others for kind actions…” (Hutcheson 1724, 101). Along with his disagreement with the Hobbesian characteristics of humankind, Hutcheson also discusses whether all human action comes from self-interest, arguing against psychological egoism. Hutcheson acknowledged that it is in everyone’s advantage to form cooperative units and that this interdependence is necessary for mankind’s survival (Hutcheson 1730, 134-5). This view agrees partially with what is referred to as prudentialism, as discussed by Hobbes and Pufendorf. Prudentialism is the theory that all cooperation and sociability comes from a self-interested motive. So people make friends or are kind because they know in the long run the effort will benefit their projects and survival—it is prudent to at least feign to care for others. Where Hutcheson disagreed with Hobbes and Pufendorf was over the claim that self-interest is the only motive for social life and/or caring for others. Hutcheson claimed that human beings have other natural affections and appetites “immediately implanted by nature, which are not directed towards physical pleasures or advantage but towards certain higher things which in themselves depend on associating with others” (Hutcheson 1730, 135).

Hutcheson could not imagine a rational creature sufficiently satisfied or happy in a state that would not include love and friendship with others. Hutcheson allowed that this person could have all the pleasant sensations of the external senses along with “the perceptions of beauty, order, harmony.” But that wouldn’t be enough (ibid. V. 144).  When discussing the pleasures of wealth and other external pleasures, Hutcheson connected the enjoyments of these with our experiences and involvement with others. For Hutcheson, even in an imaginary state of wealth, we include others. Hutcheson asked whether these kinds of ideas of wealth do not always include “some moral enjoyments of society, some communication of pleasure, something of love, of friendship, of esteem, of gratitude” (ibid. VI.147). Hutcheson asked more directly, “Who ever pretended to a taste of these pleasures without society” (ibid. VI. 147). So even in our imagination, while enjoying great wealth and material success, we are doing so in the company of others.

There is another minor disagreement between Hobbes and Hutcheson over what is considered funny, specifically what makes us laugh. Though taking up only small sections in Hobbes’ Human Nature (9. 13) and Leviathan (I.6.42), Hobbes’ claim that infirmity causes laughter was addressed by Hutcheson in “Thoughts [Reflections] on Laughter and Observations on ‘The Fable of the Bees.’” In this collection of six letters, Hutcheson also addresses his disagreements with Mandeville.  These letters, though not as well known today, could well have been quite influential essays when they were published originally in the Dublin Journal. They are also an excellent illustration of Hutcheson’s skills in argumentation.

5. Influences on Hume and Smith 

The moral sentimentalist theories of David Hume and Adam Smith were able to move past the Hobbesian view of human nature as both men considered Hutcheson to have handily defeated Hobbes’ argument. Hume does not take on Hobbes directly as he explains that “[m]any able philosophers have shown the insufficiency of these systems” (EPM, Appendix 2.6.17). Without Hutcheson’s successful argument for natural benevolence in human nature, Hume’s and Smith’s moral theories were not feasible because an innate care and concern for others and for society are both basic to their theories.

As a professor at the University of Glasgow, Hutcheson taught Smith, and his writings influenced both Smith and Hume by setting the empirical and psychological tone for both of their moral theories. Hutcheson particularly set up Hume’s moral theory in three ways. Hutcheson argued—as far as Hume was concerned, successfully—against humankind being completely self-interested. Hutcheson also described the mechanism of the internal moral sense that generates moral sentiments (although Hume’s description differed slightly, the mechanism in Hume’s account has many of the same characteristics). In connection to these two Hutcheson themes (the argument against human beings as solely self-interested and a moral sense wherein moral sentiments are felt), Hutcheson also made an argument for a naturally occurring instinct of benevolence in humankind. It was with these three Hutcheson themes that Hume and Smith began articulating their respective moral theories.

It is impossible to know how much Smith was influenced by Hutcheson. Many of Smith’s theories, especially concerning government regulations, property rights and unalienable rights, certainly resemble those espoused by Hutcheson. These were all addressed in the second treatise of the Inquiry (sections v-vii), where Hutcheson aligns the naturally occurring benevolence with feelings of honor, shame and pity, and with the evaluations of the moral sense—and also explains the way benevolence affects human affairs and the happiness of others. Smith’s ideas in Wealth of Nations align with Hutcheson on such issues as the division of labor and the compatibility of the amount and difficulty of labor with its value. Smith was also influenced by Hutcheson’s discussion of the cost of goods being dependent on the difficulty of acquiring them plus the demand for them (Systems II. 10. 7). Also of note in the same chapter is an insightful description for the use of coinage, gold and silver in the exchange of goods and the role of government in the use of coins. Overall, Hutcheson’s timely and meticulous attention to these kinds of social, economic and political details was not only instrumental to Smith’s development but also to that of the American colonies. The latter could have resulted specifically from Hutcheson’s A Short Introduction to Moral Philosophy being translated from Latin into English and used at American universities such as Yale.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Hutcheson

  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1724. Reflections on the Common Systems of Morality. In Francis Hutcheson: On Human Nature, ed. Thomas Mautner, 1993. 96-106. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • Hutcheson, Francis. Philosophical Writings, ed. R. S. Downie. Everyman’s Library. 1994. London: Orion Publishing Group.
  • Hutcheson’s Writings (selection) ed. John McHugh in the Library of Scottish Philosophy series ed. Gordon Graham. Forthcoming 2014
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1725. An Inquiry Concerning the Original of Our Ideas of Virtue or Moral Good. Selections reprinted in British Moralists, ed. L. A. Selby –Bigge, 1964. 69-177. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1728. Illustrations upon the Moral Sense. Selections reprinted in British moralists, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge. 1964. 403-418. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1730. Inaugural Lecture on the Social Nature of Man. In Francis Hutcheson: On Human Nature, ed. Thomas Mautner. 1993. 124-147. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1742. An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections. Selections reprinted in British moralists, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge. 1964. 392-402. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1755. A System of Moral Philosophy. Selection reprinted in British moralists, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge. 1964. 419-425. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.

i. Collected Works and Correspondence

  • Liberty Fund Natural Law and Enlightenment series: General Editor, Knud Haakonssen. Liberty Fund, Indianapolis, Indiana U.S.A.
  • 1725 An Inquiry into the Original of Our ideas of Beauty and Virtue. 2004
  • 1742 An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections, with the Illustrations on the Moral Sense. 2002
  • 1742 Logic, Metaphysics, and the Natural Sociability of Mankind. 2006
  • 1745 (Translated into English 1747) Philosophiae Moralis Instituitio Compendiaria with A Short Introduction to Moral Philosophy. ed. Luigi Turco. 2007
  • 1755 Meditations of the Emperor Marcus Aurelius Antonius. 2008
  • 1729 “Thoughts on Laughter and Observations on ‘The Fable of the Bees’” in The Correspondence and Occasional Writings of Francis Hutcheson  2014

b. Secondary Readings

  • Berry, Christopher J. 2003. “Sociality and Socialization.” The Cambridge Companion to the Scottish Enlightenment, ed. Alexander Broadie, Cambridge University Press.
  • Blackstone, William T. 1965. Francis Hutcheson & Contemporary Ethical Theory. University of Georgia Press.
  • Broadie, Alexander, ed. 2003. The Cambridge Companion to the Scottish Enlightenment. Cambridge University Press.
  • Brown, Michael. 2002. Francis Hutcheson in Dublin 1719-1730: The Crucible of his Thought. Four Courts Press.
  • Carey, Daniel. 1999. Hutcheson. In The Dictionary of Eighteenth-Century British Philosophers, eds. John Yolton, John Valdimir Price, and John Stephens. Two volumes.Vol. II: 453-460. Bristol, England: Thoemmes Press.
  • D’Arms, Justin and Daniel Jacobson. 2000. Sentiment and Value. In Ethics 110 (July): 722-748. The University of Chicago.
  • Daniels, Norman and Keith Lehrer. Eds. 1998. Philosophical Ethics. Dimensions of Philosophy Series. Boulder, Colorado: Westview Press.
  • Darwall, Stephen. 1995. The British Moralists and the Internal ‘Ought’ 1640 – 1740. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Darwell, Stephen, Allan Gibbard, and Peter Railton, eds.1997. Moral Discourse and Practice. Oxford University Press.
  • Emmanuel, Steven, ed. 2001. The Blackwell Guide to the Modern Philosophers. Massachusetts: Blackwell Press.
  • Gill, Michael. 1996. Fantastic Associations and Addictive General Rules: A fundamental difference between Hutcheson and Hume. Hume Studies vol. XXII, no. 1 (April): 23-48.
  • Graham, Gordon. 2001. Morality and Feeling in the Scottish Enlightenment. Philosophy. Volume 76.
  • Haakonssen, Knud. 1996. Natural Law and Moral Philosophy: From Grotius to the Scottish Enlightenment. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Haakonssen, Knud. 1998. Adam Smith. Aldershot, England: Dartmouth Publishing Company Limited and Ashgate Publishing Limited.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 2000. Explaining Value. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Herman, Arthur. 2002. How the Scots Invented the Modern World: The True story of How Western Europe’s Poorest Nation Created Our World. Broadway Books.
  • Hope, Vincent. 1989. Virtues by Consensus: The Moral Philosophy of Hutcheson, Hume, and Adam Smith. Oxford University Press.
  • Hobbes, Thomas. 1651. Leviathan, ed. Edwin Curley. 1994. Indiana, USA: Hackett Press.
  • Hobbes, Thomas. 1651. Human Nature: or the Fundamental Elements of Policy. In British Moralists, ed. D.D. Raphael, 1991. Pp. 3-17. Indiana USA: Hackett Press.
  • Hume, David. 1740. A Treatise of Human Nature, eds. L. A. Selby-Bigge and P. H. Nidditch. second edition, 1978. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hume, David. 1751. Enquiries Concerning the Human Understanding and Concerning the Principles of Morals, eds. L. A. Selby-Bigge and P. H. Nidditch. Revised third edition, 1975. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • LaFollette, Hugh, ed. 2000. The Blackwell Guide to Ethical Theory. Massachusetts: Blackwell Publishers.
  • LaFollette, Hugh. 1991. The truth in Ethical Relativism. Journal of Social Philosophy. 146-54.
  • Kivy, Peter. 2003. The Seventh Sense: A Study of Francis Hutcheson’s Aesthetics and Its Influence in Eighteenth-Century Britain. 2nd edition. New York: Franklin.
  • Mackie, J. L. 1998. The Subjectivity of Values. In Ethical Theories, third edition, ed. Louis Pojman. 518 – 537.Wadworth Publishing.
  • Mautner, Thomas, ed. 1993. Francis Hutcheson: Two Texts on Human Nature. Cambridge University Press.
  • McDowell, John.1997. Projection and Truth in Ethics. In Moral Discourse and Practice, eds. Stephen Darwall, Allan Gibbard, Peter Railton. Chapter 12: 215 – 225. Oxford Press.
  • McNaughton, David. 1999. Shaftesbury. In The Dictionary of Eighteenth-Century British Philosophers, eds. John Yolton, John Valdimir Price, and John Stephens. Two volumes. Vol.1: 781-788. Bristol, England: Thoemmes Press.
  • Mercer, Philip. 1972. Sympathy and Ethics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Mercer, Philip. 1995. “Hume’s concept of sympathy.” Ethics, Passions, Sympathy, ‘Is’ and ‘Ought.’  David Hume: Critical Assessments. Volume IV: 437 – 60. London and New York: Routledge Press.
  • Moore, James. 1990. “The Two Systems of Francis Hutcheson: On the Origins of the Scottish Enlightenment,” in Studies in the Philosophy of the Scottish Enlightenment, ed. M.A. Stewart. Pp. 37-59. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Moore, James. 1995. “Hume and Hutcheson.” Hume and Hume’s Connections, eds. M. A. Stewart and James P. Wright. 23-57. The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Price, John Valdimir. 1999. “Hume.” The dictionary of eighteenth-century British philosophers, eds. John Yolton, John Valdimir Price, and John Stephens. Two volumes. Volume II: 440-446. Bristol, England: Thoemmes Press.
  • Russell, Paul. 1995. Freedom and Moral Sentiments, Oxford University Press.
  • Schneewind, J. B. 1990. Moral Philosophy from Montagne to Kant: An Anthology. Volumes I and II. Cambridge University Press.
  • Schneider, Louis. 1967. The Scottish Moralists: On Human Nature and Society. Phoenix Books, University of Chicago.
  • Scott, William Robert. 1900. Francis Hutcheson, His Life, Teaching and Position in the History of Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, Reprint 1966 New York: A. M. Kelley.
  • Strasser, Mark. 1990. Francis Hutcheson’s Moral Theory. Wakefield, New Hampshire: Longwood Academic.
  • Strasser, Mark. 1991-2. “Hutcheson on Aesthetic Perception.” Philosophia 21: 107-18
  • Stewart, M. A. and Wright, John P., eds. 1995. Hume and Hume’s Connections. The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Taylor, W. L. 1965. Francis Hutcheson and David Hume as Predecessors of Adam Smith. Duke University Press.
  • Turco, Luigi. 2003. “Moral Sense and the Foundations of Morals.” The Cambridge Companion to the Scottish Enlightenment, ed. Alexander Broadie, Cambridge University Press.
  • Yolton, John, John Valdimir Price, and John Stephens, eds.1999. The Dictionary of Eighteenth-Century British Philosophers, Two volumes. Bristol, England: Thoemmes Press.


Author Information

Phyllis Vandenberg
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.


Abigail DeHart
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.


clock2Time is what we use a clock to measure. Information about time tells us the durations of events, when they occur, and which events happen before which others. Nevertheless, despite 2,500 years of investigation into the nature of time, there are many unresolved issues. Here is a list of those issues, in no particular order: •What time actually is; •Whether time exists when nothing is changing; •What kinds of time travel are possible; •Why time has an arrow; •Whether the future and past are as real as the present; •How to correctly analyze the metaphor of time’s flow; •Which features of our ordinary sense of the word "time" should be captured by the concept of time in physics; •Whether contingent sentences about the future have truth values now; •When time will end; •Whether there was time before the beginning of our big bang; •Whether tensed facts or tenseless facts are ontologically basic or fundamental; •What the proper formalism or logic is for capturing the special role that time plays in reasoning; •What neural mechanisms account for our experience of time; •Which aspects of time are conventional; •How time is related to mind; •Whether there is a timeless substratum from which time emerges; •Why our universe has time instead of no time; •Whether the concept of time is objective; and •Whether time is an illusion.

Consider this one issue upon which philosophers are deeply divided: What sort of ontological differences are there among the present, the past and the future? There are three competing theories. Presentists argue that necessarily only present objects and present experiences are real, and we conscious beings recognize this in the special vividness of our present experience compared to our dim memories of past experiences and our expectations of future experiences. So, the dinosaurs have slipped out of reality even though our current ideas of them have not. However, according to the growing-past theory, the past and present are both real, but the future is not real because the future is indeterminate or merely potential. Dinosaurs are real, but our future death is not. The third theory is that there are no objective ontological differences among present, past, and future because the differences are merely subjective. This third theory is called “eternalism.”

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. How is Time Related to Mind?
  3. What is Time?
    1. The Negative Answer: Time is Not Real
      1. Because Time is Subjective
      2. Because Time is Conventional
      3. Because Time is Inconsistent
      4. Because Time is Emergent
    2. The Positive Answer: Time is Real
    3. Why is There Time Instead of No Time?
    4. Is Time Ever Circular?
    5. Does Time Have a Beginning or End?
    6. Does Time Emerge from Something More Fundamental?
    7. Which Aspects of Time are Conventional?
  4. What does Science Require of Time?
  5. What Kinds of Time Travel are Possible?
  6. Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)
    1. History of the Debate before Einstein
    2. History of the Debate after Einstein
  7. McTaggart's A-Theory and B-Theory
  8. Does Time Flow?
  9. What are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?
    1. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism, and the Block-Universe
    2. Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?
    3. Persist, Endure, Perdure, and Four-Dimensionalism
    4. Truth Values and Free Will
    5. Are There Essentially-Tensed Facts?
  10. What Gives Time Its Arrow?
    1. Time without an Arrow
    2. What Needs To Be Explained
    3. Explanations or Theories of the Arrow
    4. Multiple Arrows
    5. Reversing the Arrow
  11. What is Temporal Logic?
  12. Supplements
    1. Frequently Asked Questions
    2. What Else Science Requires of Time
    3. Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)
  13. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Philosophers of time would like to resolve as many issues as they can from the list of philosophical issues mentioned in the opening summary. Some issues are intimately related to others so that it is reasonable to expect a resolution of one to have deep implications for another. For example, there is an important subset of related philosophical issues about time that cause many philosophers of time to divide into two broad camps, the A-camp and the B-camp, because they are on the opposite sides of those issues.

Members of the A-camp often say that McTaggart's A-theory is the fundamental way to view time; events are always changing as they move farther away from the distant future, the now is objectively real and so is time's flow; ontologically we should accept either presentism or the growing-past theory; predictions are not true or false at the time they are uttered; tensed facts are ontologically fundamental rather than untensed facts; and the ontologically fundamental objects are 3-dimensional, not 4-dimensional. [All these ideas will be explained in more detail later. A person can be considered a member of the A-camp without adopting every one of the above claims.]

Members of the B-camp often say instead that McTaggart's B-theory is the fundamental way to view time; events never change; the now is not objectively real and neither is time's flow; ontologically we should accept eternalism and the block-universe theory; predictions are true or false at the time they are uttered; untensed facts are more fundamental than tensed facts; and the fundamental objects are not 3-dimensional but rather 4-dimensional events or processes.

This article provides an introduction to the controversy between the A and B camps, as well as an introduction to many other issues about time.

2. How is Time Related to Mind?

Physical time is public time, the time that clocks are designed to measure. Biological time, by contrast, is indicated by an organism's various internal clocks or cyclic processes such as its heartbeats and its sleep/wake cycle (circadian rhythm). It is also indicated by signs of aging. Psychological time is different from both physical time and biological time. Psychological time is private time. It is also called phenomenological time, and it is best understood not as a kind of time but rather as awareness of physical time.

We don't need to look at a clock to detect time's existence. We mentally encounter time by seeing a leaf fall, hearing a new word in a conversation, or feeling the impact of the next step as we descend a staircase. We are noticing changes. But if we close our eyes, hear nothing, and sit still, we still can encounter time by imagining a bird landing on a tree branch. What all these encounters with time have in common is that we are having more and more experiences and accumulating more and more memories of our experiences. The leading explanation of why psychological time exists is accumulation of memories.

People who suffer from what psychologists call “anterograde amnesia” are often said not to be able to form new memories. That must be a bit of an overstatement because people with the disease can see a leaf flutter to the ground. So, they form new, very short-term memories of the leaf having moved to a new location that is different from the location they remember it having had a moment ago, even if they soon forget that they saw a leaf fall. Nevertheless, the people with this disease have a very odd sense of psychological time, and as a consequence fail to have the kind of personal identity that the rest of us have.

Psychological time's rate of passage is a fascinating phenomenon to study. Our psychological time, our awareness of physical time, slows down when it appears to us that physical time speeds up. Time seems to speed up when we mentally immerse ourselves in some activity, such as watching a very interesting TV program. At the end of the program, we think, “Where did the time go? It sped by.” Physical time did not really speed up; instead, our mental clock slowed down.

Psychological time speeds up when it appears to us that some process is taking too long. We are waiting anxiously for the pot of soup to boil on the stove, or we are hungry and watching the clock waiting for it to finally reach 12:00 when we can leave for lunch, and we think, “Why is everything taking so long?” Our belief in the apparent slowness of the external world is probably due to focusing our attention on short periods of physical time.

Time seems to slow down when we fear imminent danger. Psychologists report that during stressful periods we take in a great deal of new memories, more than we otherwise would. We remember so many details, as if we had extra time for the remembering. This massive accumulation of memories has been suggested as the causes of physical time’s apparent slowing.

Time seems to older people to go faster. You might notice this when your grandmother says, "Oh, it's my birthday again." This may be due to the fact that a younger person's birthday experience is new and more special and so more details get remembered, whereas an older person's birthday experience normally not as special, and so less information is taken into memory about that birthday.

Time seems to run slower or faster depending upon where we are in the spectrum of conscious experience: having heightened awareness, awake normally, involved in a daydream, sleeping normally, drugged with anesthetics, or in a coma.

There is no experimental evidence that the character of physical time is affected in any way by the presence or absence of awareness or the presence or absence of any biological phenomenon. For that reason, physical time is called "objective time."

When a physicist defines speed to be the rate of change of position with respect to time, the term “time” in that definition refers to physical time. Physical time is more fundamental than psychological time for helping us understand our shared experiences in the world, and so it is more useful for doing physical science, but psychological time is vitally important for understanding many mental experiences, as is biological time for understanding biological phenomena.

A major philosophical problem is to explain the origin and character of our temporal experiences. Philosophers and cognitive scientists continue to investigate, but so far do not agree on, either how we experience temporal phenomena or how we are conscious that we do. A pessimistic physicist, Julian Barbour, says, "I do not believe that science (or religion) will ever explain why we experience instants...." (Barbour 1999, p. 255)

With the notable exception of Husserl, most philosophers say our ability to imagine other times is a necessary ingredient in our having any consciousness at all. We make use of our ability to imagine other times when we experience a difference between our present perceptions and our present memories of past perceptions. Somehow the difference between the two gets interpreted by us as evidence that the world we are experiencing is changing through time with some events succeeding other events. Locke said our train of ideas produces our idea that events succeed each other in time, but he offered no details on how this train does the producing.

Although cerebral cortex is usually considered to be the base for our conscious experience, it is surprising that rats distinguish a single time interval from another—such as the difference between a five second interval and a forty second interval—even with their cerebral cortex removed. This must be happening subconsciously.

Philosophers also want to know which aspects of time we have direct experience of, and which we have only indirect experience of. Is our direct experience only of the momentary present, the instantaneous present, as Aristotle, Thomas Reid, and Alexius Meinong believed, or instead do we have direct experience of what William James called a "specious present," a short stretch of physical time? Among those accepting the notion of a specious present, there is continuing controversy about whether the individual specious presents can overlap each other and about how the individual specious presents combine to form our stream of consciousness.

The brain takes an active role in building a mental scenario of what is taking place beyond the brain. For one example, the "time dilation effect" in psychology occurs when events involving an object coming toward you last longer in psychological time than an event with the same object being stationary. For another example, try tapping your nose with one hand and your knee with your other hand at the same time. Even though it takes longer for the signal from your knee to reach your brain than the signal from your nose to reach your brain, you will have the experience of the two taps being simultaneous—thanks to the brain's manipulation of the data. Neuroscientists suggest that your brain waits about 80 milliseconds for all the relevant input to come in before you experience a “now.” This is sufficient physical time for the brain to manipulate data arriving from your nose and data arriving from your knee. Craig Callender surveyed the psycho-physics literature on human experience of the present, and concluded that, only if the duration in physical time between two experienced events is less than about a quarter of a second (250 milliseconds) will humans say both events happened simultaneously. This 250 millisecond duration is slightly different for different people but is stable within the experience of any single person. Also, "our impression of subjective present-ness...can be manipulated in a variety of ways" such as by what other sights or sounds are present at nearby physical times. See (Callender 2003-4, p. 124) and (Callender 2008).

Within the field of cognitive science, researchers want to know what are the neural mechanisms that account for our experience of time—for our awareness of change, for our sense of time’s flow, for our ability to place events into the correct time order (temporal succession), and for our ability to notice, and often accurately estimate, durations (persistence). Suppose you live otherwise normally within a mine for a while, and are temporarily closed off from the world above. You can keep track of whether it is night or day outside; you can give a good estimate of how long it will be until noon; and you can keep track of how long you've been inside the mine. And you can do all three of these things simultaneously.

The most surprising experimental result about our experience of time is Benjamin Libet’s experiments in the 1970s that apparently show that the brain events involved in initiating our free choice occur approximately one-third of a second before we are aware of our choice. Before Libet’s work, it was universally claimed that a person is aware of deciding to act freely, then later the body initiates the action. Libet's work has been used to challenge this claim. However, Libet's own experiments have been difficult to repeat because he drilled through the skull and inserted electrodes to shock the underlying brain tissue. See (Damasio 2002) for more discussion of Libet's experiments.

Neuroscientists and psychologists have investigated whether they can speed up our minds relative to a duration of physical time. If so, we might become mentally more productive, and get more high quality decision making done per fixed amount of physical time, and learn more per minute. Several avenues have been explored: using cocaine, amphetamines and other drugs; undergoing extreme experiences such as jumping backwards off a tall bridge with bungee cords attached to one's ankles; and trying different forms of meditation. So far, none of these avenues have led to success productivity-wise.

Philosophers of time and psychologists are interested in both how a person's temporal experiences are affected by deficiencies in their imagination and their memory and what kind of interventions in a healthy person's brain might control that person's temporal experience.

It has been suggested by some philosophers that Einstein’s theory of relativity, when confirmed, showed us that physical time depends on the observer, and thus that physical time is subjective, or dependent on the mind. This error is probably caused by Einstein’s overuse of the term “observer.” Einstein’s theory implies that the duration (the measure of the elapsed time) of a non-instantaneous event depends on the observer’s frame of reference, and so can be different for different observers, but what Einstein means by “observer” is merely a perspective or coordinate system from which measurements could be made. The “observer” need not have a mind. So, Einstein is not making a point about mind-dependence.

To mention one more issue about the relationship between mind and time, if all organisms were to die, there would be events after those deaths. The stars would continue to shine, but would any of these star events be in the future? This is a controversial question because advocates of McTaggart’s A-theory will answer “yes,” whereas advocates of McTaggart’s B-theory will answer “no” and say “Whose future?”

The issue of whether time itself is subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon, is explored in a later section of this article, and there is more commentary on the relationship between time and mind.

According to René Descartes' dualistic philosophy of mind, the mind is not in space, but it is in time. The current article accepts the more popular philosophy of mind that rejects dualism and claims that our mind is in time because of some proper functioning of our brain over time.

For more on the consciousness of time and related issues, see the article “Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness.” For a video presentation of these issues, see (Carroll 2012).

The remainder of this article is devoted to physical time.

3. What is Time?

Here are three, brief responses, to the question, "What is time?"

(1) The existence of time is the directionality of the temporal structure of the universe due to later states of the universe being produced from the earlier states.

This response is saying what time is. It is not an attempt to define the word "time" with terminology not involving time.

(2) Physical time is what we intend to measure with a clock.

This answer is not as trivial as it might seem since it is a deep truth about our physical universe that it is capable of having a clock. Also, we are lucky we live in a universe with so many different kinds of clocks: pendulums, oscillating electric circuits, rotations of our planet, candles that burn at a predictable rate, and so forth. Clocks count repetitions of some process that is regular in the sense that each repetition of the process has the same duration. If it were just as likely for any process to go forward as to go backwards (for example, our planet randomly changes its rotational velocity, and pendulums swing randomly), then there could be no clocks. One related philosophical issue is whether a universe can have time without being capable of having a clock. What is required to be a clock, and how we use clocks to establish the standard clock for our civilization, are some of the topics examined in the accompanying supplement to this article.

(3) Time is what the time variable t is denoting in the best theories of fundamental science. These theories are relativity, quantum field theory, the Standard Model of elementary particles, the big bang Theory, the theory of statistical thermodynamics, and so forth.

The three answers just given to the question, "What is time?" are informative. However, when philosophers ask the question, they normally do not want such a succinct answer. They want to be told more about the nature of time. They complain that the full nature of physical time can be revealed only by adding a philosophical theory of time that addresses the many philosophical issues that scientists do not concern themselves with. So, let us continue to explore the nature of time. The exploration will presuppose a realist perspective on the scientific theories to be discussed ahead. It interprets them to mean what they say, and it does not take a fictionalist perspective on them and consider their ontological implications as being merely a useful fiction.

When we measure time we are not measuring an object or substance. If time actually exists, then we are measuring "something" that is pervasive or global. It occurs everywhere. However, it is not universal; it is not the same for each person. This is because of the theory of relativity, as we shall see.

Here are five important characteristics of time. (1) For any event, time fixes when it occurs. (2) For any event, it fixes the event's duration. (3) For any event, it fixes what other events occur simultaneously with it. (4) For any pair of events, it fixes which one happens first. (5) It has an arrow pointing from past events toward future events.

The most significant impact that the special theory of relativity had upon the philosophy of time was to merge time with space. The implication is that the first four of these five characteristics are all relative; they can be different in different reference frames. Nevertheless, within a single reference frame, these are still key characteristics of time. The impact of the general theory was even more spectacular because time had to be entwined with gravity, as will be discussed later.

An Aristotelian approach to the issue of what time is would ask for time's essential characteristics as opposed to its accidental characteristics. This article is content merely to reveal time's important characteristics and to explore the philosophical issues involving time. But before proceeding with the search for the fuller answer to our question "What is time?", let us clarify some terminology.

The term "moment" is ambiguous in English. Moments are short events, but they also are the durations of those events. Speakers are usually not careful to disambiguate for us, so we hearers have to rely on context to tell which sense is intended. In addition, the terms "moment" and "instant" are sometimes used synonymously. We might mean the same thing whether we say, "I'll be back in an instant," or "I'll be back in a moment." In physics, the term "instant" has a more precise sense. That kind of instant is a zero duration (and not has a zero duration).

Relativity theory implies that part of the correct answer to the question "What is time?" is that it is a linear continuum of instants. This implies that time is gap-free, and not discrete or granular.

continuous vs discrete

Being a continuum implies that the times, and thus the instants, have the structure of the real numbers in their natural order rather than merely the structure of the integers. If time were discrete or granular, it would have a smallest, positive duration, and so times would have a structure like that of the integers. Time would be digital rather than analog. There is no evidence that time is not a continuum.

Sometimes ordinary speakers will say instantaneous events are instants. However, physicists will say instants are times, and instantaneous events are not instants; they are events that last only for an instant [in the sense of duration] and only at an instant [in the sense of a single time coordinate].

In 1929, the English philosopher Bertrand Russell offered these precise definitions of instant and of occurring at an instant:

X is an instant iff X is an exhaustive class of mutually overlapping events.

Event E is at instant X iff E is a member of X.

The term "iff" is the philosopher's abbreviation for "if and only if." On Russell's definition, an instant is an event or event class, but not a time.

How about finding a precise definition of the word "time"? Shouldn't that tell us what time really is? The word "time" is the most common noun on the Internet. It might help us understand time if we improved our understanding of the sense of the word. Should philosophers of time pursue a full definition of the word? No—at least not if the definition must be some analysis that provides a simple paraphrase in all its occurrences. There are just too many varied occurrences of the word: time out, behind the times, in the nick of time, and so forth.

But how about narrowing the goal to the main meaning of the word “time," the meaning that is most interesting philosophers and physicists? Well, this project, too, would require some consideration of the grammar of the word “time.” Ordinary-language philosophers have studied time talk, what Wittgenstein called the “language game” of discourse about time. Wittgenstein said in 1953:

For a large class of cases — though not for all — in which we employ the word ‘meaning’ it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language.

If the word "time" were a member of this large class, then by drawing attention to use, to ordinary ways of using the word "time," Wittgenstein expected we will be able to dissolve rather than answer most of our philosophical questions. Unfortunately, the word "time" probably is not a member of the large class that Wittgenstein is speaking of, and even if it were, most philosophers want to know much more than what "time" means. Philosophers of time are usually not interested in precisely defining the word but rather are interested in what time's important characteristics are and in resolving philosophical disputes about time that do not seem to turn on what the word means. When Newton discovered that the fall of an apple and the circular orbit of the moon were both caused by gravity, this was not a discovery about the meaning of "gravity," but rather about what gravity is. Do we not want something like this for time?

a. The Negative Answer: Time is Not Real

We can see a clock, but we cannot see time, so how do we know whether time is real? You might think that time is real because it is what clocks are designed to measure, and because there certainly are clocks. The trouble with this reasoning is that it is analogous to saying that unicorns are real because unicorn hunters intend to find unicorns, and because there certainly are unicorn hunters.

The logical positivist Rudolf Carnap said, "The external questions of the reality of physical space and physical time are pseudo-questions" ("Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology," 1950). He meant the questions are meaningless because there is no way to empirically verify their answer one way or the other. Subsequent philosophers have generally disagreed with Carnap and have taken the questions seriously.

Nobody doubts that the concept of time has immense practical value, but there are serious reasons to believe time itself is not real. Those reasons are that time is unreal in the sense of being (i) subjective, or (ii) conventional, or (iii) denoted by an inconsistent concept, or (iv) emergent. These are different claims, but let’s consider all of them.

i. Because Time is Subjective

It has been claimed that time is not real because it is merely subjective. Psychological time is subjective, but the focus now is on physical time. Any organism’s sense of time is subjective, but is the time that is sensed also subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon, something that depends upon being represented by a mind? Throughout history, philosophers of time have disagreed on the answer. Without minds, nothing in the world would be surprising or beautiful or interesting. Can we add that nothing would be in time? In other words, can we say time is not objective? If so, we might for that reason say time is not real because it is not objectively real.

Aristotle raised the issue of the mind-dependence of time when he said, “Whether, if soul (mind) did not exist, time would exist or not, is a question that may fairly be asked; for if there cannot be someone to count there cannot be anything that can be counted…” (Physics, chapter 14). He does not answer his own question because, he says rather profoundly, it depends on whether time is the conscious numbering of movement or instead is just the capability of movements to be numbered were consciousness to exist.

St. Augustine, clearly adopted a subjective view of time, and said time is nothing in reality but exists only in the mind’s apprehension of that reality. The 13th century philosophers Henry of Ghent and Giles of Rome said time exists in reality as a mind-independent continuum, but is distinguished into earlier and later parts only by the mind.

ii. Because Time is Conventional

Philosophers generally agree that humans invented the concept of time, but some argue that time itself is invented. It was created as a useful convention, like when we decided to use certain coin-shaped metal objects as money. Money is culturally real but not objectively real because it would disappear if human culture were to disappear, even if the coin-shaped objects were not to disappear.

Although it would be inconvenient to do so, our society could eliminate money and return to barter transactions. Analogously, Callender asks us to consider the question, “Who Needs Time Anyway”?

Time is a way to describe the pace of motion or change, such as the speed of a light wave, how fast a heart beats, or how frequently a planet spins…but these processes could be related directly to one another without making reference to time. Earth: 108,000 beats per rotation. Light: 240,000 kilometers per beat. Thus, some physicists argue that time is a common currency, making the world easier to describe but having no independent existence. (Callender 2010, p. 63)

In 1905, the French physicist Henri Poincaré argued that time is not a feature of reality to be discovered, but rather is something we've invented for our convenience. He said possible empirical tests cannot determine very much about time, so he recommended the convention of adopting whatever concept of time that makes for the simplest laws of physics. Nevertheless, time is conventional, not objective, not a “natural kind” of thing.

iii. Because Time is Inconsistent

Bothered by the contradictions they claimed to find in our concept of time, Parmenides, Zeno, Plato, Spinoza, Hegel, and McTaggart said time is not real. McTaggart believed he had a convincing argument for why a single event is a future event, a present event and also a past event, and that since these are contrary properties, our concept of time is self-contradictory. (For a fuller discussion of their arguments, see LePoidevin and MacBeath 1993.)

The early 20th century absolute-idealist philosopher F. H. Bradley claimed, “Time, like space, has most evidently proved not to be real, but a contradictory appearance…. The problem of change defies solution.”

In the mid-twentieth century, Kurt Gödel argued for the unreality of time because the equations of the general theory of relativity allow for physically possible universes in which all events precede themselves. It shouldn't even be possible for time to be like this, Gödel believed, so if we suppose time is the time of relativity theory, then time is not real.

iv. Because Time is Emergent

It has been argued that time is not real because it is emergent. Leibniz argued it emerges from the order relations between pairs of events; Minkowski argued it emerges from spacetime; advocates of the theory of loop quantum gravity argue it emerges from quantum fields.

The English physicist Julian Barbour said, “I now believe that time does not exist at all, and that motion itself is pure illusion" (Barbour 1999, p. 4). "The here and now arises not from a past, but from the totality of things..." (p. 313). He then offered an exotic explanation (which won't be described here) of how nature creates the false impression that time exists. He argued that there does exist objectively an infinity of individual, instantaneous moments, but there is no objective happens-before ordering of them, no objective time order. There is just a vast, jumbled heap of moments (p. 37). Each moment is an instantaneous configuration (relative to one observer's reference frame) of all the objects in space. If the universe is as Barbour describes, then space (the relative spatial relationships within a configuration) is ontologically fundamental, but time is not, and neither is spacetime. In this way, time is removed from the foundations of physics and emerges as some measure of the differences among the existing spatial configurations.

b. The Positive Answer: Time is Real

Proponents of the objective reality of time offer responses to the above arguments.

(i) Regarding subjectivity, notice that our clock ticks in synchrony with other clocks even when no one is paying attention to the clocks. Second, notice the ability of the concept of time to help make such good sense of our evidence involving change, persistence, and succession of events. Consider succession. This is the order of events in time. If judgments of time order were subjective in the way judgments of being interesting vs. not-interesting are subjective, then it would be too miraculous that everyone can so easily agree on the temporal ordering of so many pairs of events.

W. V. O. Quine might add the point that the character of the objective world with all its patterns is a theoretical entity in a grand inference to the best explanation of the data of our experiences, and the result of this inference tells us that the world is an entity containing an objective time, a time that gets detected by us mentally as psychological time and gets detected by our clocks as physical time.

(ii) There are several reasons to believe time is not merely conventional: (1) There are so many one-way processes in nature, processes such cold milk mixing into black coffee to produce cooler, brown coffee, and no amount of mixing turn the brown coffee into hotter black coffee with cool milk. The amalgamation of all these one-way processes is time’s arrow, and no human choice affects its existence.

(2) Our universe has so many periodic processes whose periods are constant multiples of each other over time. The different processes bear fairly consistent frequencies relative to each other. For example, the frequency of rotation of the Earth around its axis, relative to the "fixed" stars, is a constant multiple of the frequency of swings of a fixed-length pendulum, which in turn is a constant multiple of the half-life of a specific radioactive uranium isotope, which in turn is a constant multiple of the frequency of a vibrating quartz crystal. The relationships do not change as time goes by (at least not much and not for a long time, and when there is deviation we know how to predict it and compensate for it). The existence of these sorts of constant relationships—which cannot be changed by convention—makes our system of physical laws much simpler than it otherwise would be, and it makes us more confident that there is some convention-free, natural kind of entity that we are referring to with the time-variable in those physical laws.

(iii) Regarding the inconsistencies in our concept of time that Zeno, McTaggart, Bradley, and others claim to have revealed, most philosophers of time will say that there is no inconsistency, and that the complaint can be handled by revising the relevant concepts. For example, Zeno's paradoxes were treated by requiring time to be a linear continuum, very much like a segment of the real number line. Yes, the mathematicians did change Zeno’s concept, but the change was very fruitful and not ad hoc. Gödel's complaint has been treated by saying he should accept that time might possibly be circular; he needs to change his intuitions about what is essential to the concept.

(iv) Suppose time does emerge from events, or spacetime, or the quantum gravitational field, or Barbour’s moments. Does this imply time is not real? Scientists once were very surprised to learn from Ludwig Boltzmann that heat emerges from molecular motion. Yet a single molecule is neither hot nor cold, regardless of its speed. Heat is a macroscopic concept. However, would it be a mistake to say for this reason that Bolztmann has shown us that heat is not real and does not really exist in our world, and so no one has ever been affected by heat? If so, we can draw a similar conclusion for time.

String theory and loop quantum gravity are two leading, but as yet experimentally unconfirmed, theories of how to reconcile relativity theory with quantum theory. Loop quantum gravity describes phenomena occurring at the Planck scale. The Planck scale length is 10-33 centimeters. Relativity theory implies this is the minimum size of a particle below which it falls into its own black hole. The Planck time is the time it takes light to cover the Planck length. The principal equation of loop quantum gravity, the Wheeler-DeWitt equation, does not contain a time variable. If the theory is correct, then the implication will be that our concept of time is not applicable at this extreme scale. We can even say time does not exist at that scale or below. But it will not follow that time does not exist at all, because the concept of time is already known to be so extremely useful for larger scales at the level of quarks and molecules and mountains and galaxies.

Most philosophers agree that time does exist, that it is objective rather than subjective, that it is not primarily conventional, that any inconsistency in its description is merely apparent (or is not essential and can be eliminated), and that time is real regardless of whether it is emergent. Most philosophers just cannot agree on what time is, beyond agreeing to the three very brief answers given at the beginning of section 3.

Let’s explore some noteworthy answers that have been given throughout history to the question, “What is time?”

Aristotle claimed that “time is the measure of change” (Physics, chapter 12). He never said space is the measure of anything. Aristotle emphasized “that time is not change [itself]” because a change “may be faster or slower, but not time….” (Physics, chapter 10). For example, a leaf can fall faster or slower, but time itself cannot be faster or slower. In developing his views about time, Aristotle advocated what is now referred to as the relational theory when he said, “there is no time apart from change….” (Physics, chapter 11). In addition, Aristotle said time is not discrete or atomistic but “is continuous…. In respect of size there is no minimum; for every line is divided ad infinitum. Hence it is so with time” (Physics, chapter 11). The experts to this day are divided about whether to accept relationism and the continuity of time. The issue of relationism, which is intimately related to the issue of whether time requires change, gets more extensive coverage in another section of this article.

René Descartes had a very different answer to, “What is time?” He argued that a material body has the property of spatial extension but no inherent capacity for temporal endurance, and that God by his continual action sustains (or re-creates) the body at each successive instant. Time is a kind of sustenance or re-creation ("Third Meditation" in Meditations on First Philosophy). This Cartesian answer to "What is time?" has always had few proponents.

In the 18th century, Immanuel Kant said time and space are forms that the mind projects upon the external things-in-themselves; they are, to use his terminology, forms of human sensible intuition. He spoke of our mind structuring our perceptions so that space always has a Euclidean geometry, and time has the structure of the mathematical line. Kant’s idea that time is a form of apprehending phenomena is probably best taken as suggesting that we have no direct perception of time but only the ability to experience individual things and events in time. Some historians distinguish perceptual space from physical space and say that Kant was right about perceptual space. It is difficult, though, to get a clear concept of perceptual space.

Kant claimed to know a priori that space obeys the principle of Euclidean geometry. With the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 19th century and Einstein's use of those geometries as descriptive of physical spacetime, the belief that truths about space and time are knowable a priori soon lost favor.

In the general theory of relativity, time is a distinguished aspect or dimension of a more basic entity, spacetime. Gravity is any distortion of spacetime’s geometry, so a gravitational field warps time. Before Einstein, no one suspected there is such a deep connection between time and gravity.

In the early 20th century, Alfred North Whitehead said time is essentially the form of becoming—a cryptic, but interesting philosophical claim.

We mentioned earlier that a physics book will define time as a linear continuum, which is a special continuous packing of point instants. Michael Dummett, in (Dummett 2000), provides an alternative to this definition. He says time is a composition of non-zero periods rather than of instants. His model also is constructive in the sense that it implies there do not exist any times which are not detectable in principle by a physical process.

The above discussion does not exhaust all the claims about what time is, as we shall see.

c. Why is there Time Instead of No Time?

There is no agreed upon answer to why our universe contains time instead of no time, why it contains physical laws instead of no physical laws, and why it exists instead of does not exist, although there have been interesting speculations on all these issues.

One suggestion from proponents of the Multiverse Theory is that our universe exists, and exists with time and with the laws is has, because every kind of universe exists. Our single universe exists by means of a random selection process, by a process in which any possible universe inevitably arises as an actual universe, in analogy to how continual re-shuffling a deck of cards inevitably produces any possible ordering of the cards. To improve the analogy, one should suppose that there is no Supernatural Shuffler involved. For more details, see (Krauss, 2012, pp. 170 and 206).

d. Is Time Ever Circular?

Time is linear and not circular. At least there is no evidence to doubt this. But the possibility cannot be ruled out. If the totality of your personal time (what physicists call your proper time) were circular, then in the future you would be born after your death.

If any part of time were circular, then the future—at least this part of it—is also the past, and every event in that part occurs before itself. If your entire personal time were such a part, then the question would arise as to whether you were born an infinite number of times or only once. The argument that you'd be born only once appeals to Leibniz’s Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles. According to this principle, each supposedly repeating state of the world would actually not repeat but would occur just once because each state would not be discernible from the state that recurs. [What is a state of the world? Classically, it is the positions of all the world's objects and the motions of those objects at some particular instant. In field theory,, a state is the values of all the fields everywhere at some particular instant.] One way to support the idea of repeated occurrence of seemingly perfectly identical states would be to presuppose a linear ordering of the states in some "hyper" time so that each cycle is discernible from its predecessor only because it occurs at a different hyper time. That is, the cycles can be counted or ordered in hyper time. But there is no evidence of a hyper time. Another way to support the idea of repeated occurrence is to say that a person's proper time might be circular [more specifically, a closed timelike curve in spacetime] in our universe, but not from the perspective of the multiverse, and so from that perspective the number of times around the circle could be counted. The difficulty here is to make sense of the phrase "perspective of the multiverse." Most multiverse theories do not allow comparison of times between universes.

Long before Einstein made a distinction between proper time and coordinate time, a variety of answers were given to the question of whether time is like a line or a circle. The concept of linear time first appeared in the writings of the Hebrews and the Zoroastrian Iranians. The Roman writer Seneca also advocated linear time. However, Plato and most other Greeks and Romans believed time to be cyclical, but this was not envisioned as requiring the birth of Socrates after his death. The Pythagoreans and some Stoic philosophers such as Chrysippus did adopt this drastic position. Circular time was promoted in the Bible in Ecclesiastes 1:9: "That which has been is what will be, That which is done is what will be done, And there is nothing new under the sun." The idea was picked up again by Nietzsche in 1882. Scholars do not agree on whether Nietzsche meant his idea of circular time to be taken literally or merely as a moral lesson for us about how we should live our lives if each of us knew that we would have to live it over and over.

Many Islamic and Christian theologians adopted the ancient idea that time is linear. Nevertheless, it was not until 1602 that the concept of linear time was more clearly formulated—by the English philosopher Francis Bacon. In 1687, Newton advocated linear time when he represented time mathematically by using a continuous straight line with points being analogous to instants of time. Kant argued that time exists and is linear as a matter of necessity. In the early 19th century in Europe, the idea of linear time had become dominant in both science and philosophy.

Nevertheless, there are many other possible topologies for time. Time could have an end or no end. There could be two disconnected time streams, in two parallel worlds, and perhaps one would be linear and the other circular. There could be branching time, in which time is like the letter "Y". There could be a fusion time in which two different time streams are separate but then merge into one stream. Time might be two-dimensional instead of one-dimensional. For all these topologies, there could be discrete time or, instead, continuous time. For physicists, if time is not a continuum, then their favorite lower limit on a possible duration is the Planck time of about 10-43 seconds. This would be the size of an atom of time.

e. Does Time Have a Beginning or End?

In ancient Greece, Plato and Aristotle agreed that the past is eternal. Aristotle offered two reasons. Time had no beginning because, for any time, we always can imagine an earlier time. In addition, time had no beginning because, for any present situation, we always can ask for its prior cause. In the fifth century, Augustine said the universe was made with time and not in time, implying that time began with God's creation of the world a finite time ago. In the medieval period, Aquinas' contemporary St. Bonaventure agreed and said there was a first motion and thus a first time, which implies Plato and Aristotle were mistaken in believing the past is eternal.

Martin Luther estimated the world to have begun in 4,000 B.C.E. Then Johannes Kepler estimated it to have begun in 4,004 B.C.E. The Calvinist James Ussher calculated from the Bible that the world began on Friday, October 28, 4,004 B.C.E. Advances in the science of geology eventually refuted all these small estimates, and advances in astronomy eventually refuted the idea that the Earth and the universe were created at about the same time.

Isaac Newton believed future time is infinite and that, although God created the material world some finite time ago, there was an infinite period of past time before that. Physicists generally agreed with Newton until the rise of the big bang theory.

Contemporary physicists say it is most likely the future is potentially infinite, as Newton believed, but it is an open question whether past time is finite or infinite. Many physicists believe time began with the big bang event about 13.8 billion years ago. This is 13,800,000,000 years ago. The world was not created then from nothingness, as if nothingness has causal powers; it simply came into existence then. But many other physicists, a growing number of them, believe that eventually a confirmed theory will explain why the big bang was the result of earlier phenomena, and they believe past time is infinite.

According to the big bang Theory, which is a well-accepted theory in astrophysics, millions of years ago our universe once had an infinitesimal size and an almost infinite temperature and gravitational strength. Our universe has been expanding and cooling ever since. When it cooled below 1010 degrees, individual particles could form into atomic nuclei. When it cooled below 10,000 degrees, individual electrons and atomic nuclei could form into atoms. Later, as the expansion continued, many atoms clumped into stars and galaxies, eventually producing the universe of today.

The big bang theory does not speak to what happened at or before the initial big bang event. It is a theory only of the aftermath of that event. In fact, for reasons involving quantum mechanics, physicists generally agree that time is not an appropriate concept to use for times from the big bang until approximately 10-43 seconds after the big bang. (Sorry, but the concept of time had to be used in order to say the concept fails there.)

A promising version of the big bang theory called "Eternal Inflation" or the "Multiverse Theory" implies that our particular big bang event is merely one among many other big bang events occurring elsewhere both before and after our big bang. These alternative universes occurred and continue to occur within a large background spacetime that is filled with energy and that is rapidly inflating and always will. In the most popular version of the Multiverse Theory, time had no beginning. See (Greene, 2011) for a popular discussion of the different multiverse theories.

Here is a summary of some serious suggestions by cosmologists of possible alternative futures for our particular universe:

  • Big Chill (eternal expansion of space)
  • Big Crunch (eventual recollapse)
  • Big Rip (when the expansion rate increases sufficient, everything will be torn apart)
  • Big Snap (the fabric of space suddenly reveals a lethal granular nature when stretched too much)
  • Death Bubbles (some regions of space will turn into lethal bubbles that expand at the speed of light, destroying everything else)

The first alternative is the most popular. It implies a potentially infinite future, although, because of the faster and faster expansion of the universe, in about 100 billion years all the other galaxies will be moving away from the Milky Way faster than the speed of light, so they will have left our visible universe, and it will look to Earthly astronomers as if we are alone.

f. Does Time Emerge from Something More Fundamental?

Is time a basic feature of nature, or does it emerge from more basic timeless features?

The classical relationists such as Leibniz argued that time emerges from events, and if there were no events then there would be no time. The substantivalists such as Newton said time is basic and not emergent, and this position was the majority position among scientists until the rise of the theory of relativity. Relativity theory suggested to most researchers in the first half of the twentieth century that time emerges from spacetime.

Philosophers use the term “A emerges from B” in different senses: A is fully definable in terms of B, A is reducible in some form to B, and A supervenes upon B. The latter is the weakest sense of emergence. Facts about sound in the air supervene on, or are a product of, facts about changes in the molecules of the air, and that is why molecular change is more basic than sound. Hermann Minkowski argued in 1908 that we should believe spacetime is more basic than time, and this argument is generally well accepted. However, is this spacetime itself basic?

Many physicists working in the field of quantum gravity suspect that resolving the contradiction between quantum theory and gravitational theory will require forcing spacetime and thus time to emerge from some more basic timeless substrate below the level of the Planck length of 10-35 meters and the Planck time of 10-43 seconds. However, there is no empirical evidence of this, nor any agreed-upon theory of what the substrate is, other than that it is some quantum gravitational field.

Earlier it was noted that the physicist Julian Barbour claims space is fundamental, but time is not. Other physicists say time is fundamental but space is not. In 2004, after winning the Nobel Prize in physics, David Gross expressed that viewpoint:

Everyone in string theory is convinced…that spacetime is doomed. But we don’t know what it’s replaced by. We have an enormous amount of evidence that space is doomed. We even have examples, mathematically well-defined examples, where space is an emergent concept…. But in my opinion the tough problem that has not yet been faced up to at all is, “How do we imagine a dynamical theory of physics in which time is emergent?” …All the examples we have do not have an emergent time. They have emergent space but not time. It is very hard for me to imagine a formulation of physics without time as a primary concept because physics is typically thought of as predicting the future given the past. We have unitary time evolution. How could we have a theory of physics where we start with something in which time is never mentioned?

The discussion in this section about whether time is ontologically basic has no implications for whether the word “time” is semantically basic, nor for whether the concept of time is basic to concept formation.

g. Which Aspects of Time are Conventional?

The issue of whether time itself is conventional has already been discussed above, but let’s consider what aspects of time are conventional, and then discuss what aspects of time’s measurement are conventional.

The transitivity of time order is not a convention. If event 1 happens before event 2, and event 2 happens before event 3, then event 1 also happens before event 3.

Simultaneity is conventional because of the relativity of simultaneity in the theory of special relativity. Physicists generally consider statements that are objective and so not conventional to be invariant under change of reference frame, and vice versa. According to the special theory of relativity, two events which are simultaneous in one reference might not be simultaneous in a different reference frame moving with respect to the first frame. It is only by convention that we fix on one specific reference frame and from within it we declare which pairs of events are simultaneous. This relativity of simultaneity shows that simultaneity is conventional.

Because the spacetime of general relativity curves, unlike in special relativity, simultaneity holds in general relativity only locally, in the infinitesimally-sized regions of spacetime where the special theory is true.

Let’s turn now from what aspects of time are conventional to what aspects of time’s measurement are conventional, in special relativity. The duration between two events A and B is conventional in the sense that if neither could have had a causal effect on the other, then physicists can always choose a reference frame in which A and B are simultaneous, so the duration between them is zero. However, once a frame is chosen, this fixes the duration between all pairs of events.

The measure of speed of an object is also conventional. This is because physicists can always choose a reference frame fixed to the object. In this manner we can make any one object have a zero speed.

There is much more that is conventional about time’s measurement. It is merely a matter of convention that what time it is changes by one hour as we cross into a new time-zone. It is an arbitrary convention that there are twenty-four hours in a day instead of twenty-three, that no week fails to contain a Tuesday, and that a second lasts as long as it is defined to last.

Consider the ordinary way we use a clock to measure how long an event lasts. We adopt the following metric or method: Take the time of the instant at which the event ends, and subtract the time of the instant at which the event starts. For example, to find how long an event lasts that starts at 3:00 and ends at 5:00, we subtract and get the answer of two hours. Is the use of this method merely a convention, or in some objective sense is it the only way that a clock should be used? That is, is there an objective metric, or is time "metrically amorphous"? Perhaps the duration between instants x and y could be


instead of the ordinary

|y - x|.

Our civilization designs a clock to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time elapses. Is that a convention? We are forced to accept the procedure if we presuppose that durations are never negative and that we should use our clocks to measure the duration in the ordinary way. If this measure is going to be larger when durations are larger, then our clock must count up and not down.

For a philosophically deeper and thus more controversial point about convention, consider this question. Our society's standard clock tells everyone what time it really is. Can our standard clock be inaccurate? Yes, say the objectivists about the standard clock. No, say the conventionalists who claim the standard clock is accurate by convention; if it acts strangely, then all clocks must act strangely in order to stay in synchrony with the standard clock. A closely related question is whether, when we change our standard clock, we are merely adopting constitutive conventions for our convenience, or in some objective sense we are making a more, or less, correct choice.

There is an ongoing philosophical dispute about the extent to which there is an element of conventionality in Einstein’s notion of two separated events happening at the same time. The philosopher Hans Reichenbach said that to define simultaneity in a single reference frame in special relativity you must adopt a convention about how fast light travels going one way as opposed to coming back (or going any other direction). He recommended adopting the convention that light travels the same speed in all directions (in a vacuum free of the influence of gravity). He claimed it must be a convention because there is no way to measure whether the speed is really the same in opposite directions since any measurement of the two speeds between two locations requires first having synchronized clocks at those two locations, yet the synchronization process will presuppose whether the speed is the same in both directions. The philosophers B. Ellis and P. Bowman in 1967, and D. Malament in 1977, gave different reasons why Reichenbach is mistaken. Once again, this discussion presumes special relativity and not general relativity. For an introduction to this dispute, see the Frequently Asked Questions. For more discussion, see (Callender and Hoefer 2002).

It would be very helpful to physics if there were a convention we could accept that would allow for a cosmic time in which any two events could be said to be connected in the sense that either they are simultaneous or not. In general relativity, simultaneity does not always make sense globally; but it always does make sense in infinitesimally small regions where the special theory of relativity is true. Nevertheless, if we sacrifice the relativity of simultaneity and adopt the convention of using only one very special coordinate system, then sense can be made of simultaneity across the universe. The special coordinate system needs to be very curvilinear and patched. In some models of general relativity, which might apply to our universe, curving spacetime can be exhaustively partitioned into non-intersecting “bumpy” three-dimensional sheets of simultaneous events, where each sheet is locally perpendicular to time-like geodesics. The bumps are due to local curvature associated with the presence of nearby matter. Einstein’s method of operationally defining simultaneity at a distance cannot be applied globally. Nevertheless, by accepting the convention that we will use only this special coordinate system, we can make sense of saying that, all the events in one sheet throughout the universe happen simultaneously.

There is another convention that, if adopted, makes our physics much simpler. Let’s place the origin of our global coordinate frame at a place where the light (which has now turned to heat) generated by the big bang arrives with the same intensity or temperature from all directions. Astrophysicists have found this best place for the origin. (Davies 1995, pp. 128-9) describes this place:

Although the view from Earth is of a slightly skewed cosmic heat bath, there must exist a motion, a frame of reference, which would make the bath appear exactly the same in every direction. It would in fact seem perfectly uniform from an imaginary spacecraft traveling at 350 km per second in a direction away from Leo (towards Pisces, as it happens)…. We can use this special clock to define a cosmic time…. Fortunately, the Earth is moving at only 350 km per second relative to this hypothetical special clock. This is about 0.1 per cent of the speed of light, and the time-dilation factor is only about one part in a million. Thus to an excellent approximation, Earth’s historical time coincides with cosmic time, so we can recount the history of the universe contemporaneously with the history of the Earth, in spite of the relativity of time.

Cosmologists presuppose this reference frame when they make remarks such as, “The big bang began 13.8 billion years ago, but we can’t see the beginning because the first light to escape its plasma left 300,000 years later and is arriving now from all directions.”

4. What does Science Require of Time?

At the beginning of the 20th century, the appearance of the theories of relativity and the big bang transformed the investigation of time from a primarily speculative and metaphysical investigation into one that occupied scientists in their professional journals.

The big bang theory places demands on the amount of past time there must be—about 13.8 billion years. Assuming this theory, other astronomical observations suggest future time is probably not finite but rather is potentially infinite (in Aristotle's sense of the term).

The fundamental laws of science do not pick out a present time. Scientists frequently do apply some law of science while assigning, say, t0 to be the temporal coordinate of the present moment, then they go on to calculate this or that. This insertion of the fact that t0 is the present time is an initial condition of the situation to which the law is being applied, and is not part of the law itself. The basic laws themselves treat all times equally.

In a spacetime obeying the theory of relativity, there is always a maximum possible speed, a maximum ratio of distance covered, divided by time elapsed.

Scientists expect that all its theories in the future will have symmetry under time-translation. If a theory has this symmetry, then the laws of the theory do not change as time goes by. It follows that the law of gravitation in the 21st century is the same law that held one thousand centuries ago. So far, there is no evidence to indicate otherwise.

Science places special requirements on the structure of time. For instance, physicists need to speak of one event happening pi seconds after another, and of one event happening the square root of three seconds before another. In ordinary discourse outside of science, we would never need this kind of detail. This need has led to requiring time to be a linear continuum. A linear continuum has the same structure as the real numbers in their natural order. It follows from this that physical theories treat time as being somewhat like another dimension, analogous to a spatial dimension, and it follows that time is one-dimensional and not two-dimensional. Time has this structure even in quantum mechanics, which treats time as a linear continuum that is not quantized.

An instantaneous event at one place is said to be a "point" event. If we add a reference system to the space, we can name the point event. A reference system is just a perspective plus a coordinate system on the space and time. A coordinate system is a continuous labeling of events with real numbers. In this way, we can say a specific point event has just one temporal coordinate t1, with t1 being some real number, and we can say that at this time the event has just one spatial location coordinate <x1, y1, z1>, which is an ordered triple of real numbers, assuming we are assigning coordinates within a Cartesian coordinate system. By saying time has real-valued coordinates, we are implying that time's instants are gap-free and so densely packed that there is no next coordinate after t1, and between any two different temporal coordinates, there is an actual infinite number of other coordinates. The sciences have found no need to model time more densely than this, with, say, the hyperreal or surreal numbers. Nor is there any need to model time with two dimensions instead of one.

With the acceptance of relativity theory, and its implication that there are many valid perspectives or reference frames and so no one is the correct one, scientists have accepted that any objective description of the world can be made only with statements that are invariant under changes of the reference frame. The point is not to confuse features of nature with mere features of our mathematical apparatus.

Isaac Newton assumed that, if you are as tall as two meter sticks in one frame, then you are that tall even if we change the reference frame. And Newton assumed that if event 1 lasts just as long as event 2 in one frame, then this is so even if we switch frames. Einstein undermined these two Newtonian assumptions.

EinsteinEinstein's theory of relativity is the scientific theory that has had the biggest impact upon our understanding of time. Einstein said time is relative. This means some, but not all, aspects of time are relative to the chosen reference frame. Relative to, in the sense of depending upon. Newton would say that if you are seated in a moving vehicle, then your speed relative to the vehicle is zero, but your speed relative to the road is not zero. Einstein would agree. However, he would surprise Newton by saying the length of your vehicle is slightly different in the two reference frames. Equally surprising to Newton, the duration of your drinking a cup of coffee while in the vehicle is slightly different in those two reference frames. These effects are called space contraction and time dilation. So, length and duration are frame dependent.

Suppose two observers A and B are moving relative to each other. Observer A can truly say, “In a reference frame fixed to me, you are moving, but I am stationary. Your time is dilated, and so your clock is running slow compared to mine.” But observer B can truly say the same about A. How is that possible without them contradicting each other? Can two clocks really run slower than each other? The answer is yes and no, and the 'yes' sense is one of the unintuitive consequences of the theory of relativity. The 'yes' scenario produces the situation of the twin paradox, in which each observer uses a reference frame fixed to themselves. The twin paradox is explained in more detail in the Supplement that accompanies this article. The 'no' sense occurs when both observers agree to use the same reference frame. In that case, their two clocks are not running slower than each other.

With space contraction and time dilation, namely with the relativity of length and of duration, Einstein's special theory is requiring a mixing of space and time. It follows that there is an underlying spacetime which is more fundamental than either time or space alone. Spacetime divides into its space part and its time part differently for two reference frames that move relative to each other. So, to claim that an event lasted three minutes without giving even an implicit indication of the reference frame is to make an ambiguous claim. When we say the event of your drinking a cup of coffee lasted three minutes, the implicit assumption is that the reference frame is fixed to you.

One other philosophical implication of the relativity of time is that it seems to be more difficult to defend McTaggart's A-theory that says temporal properties of events such as "is happening now" or "happened in the past" are frame-free properties of those events.

Another profound implication of relativity theory is that two accurate clocks do not tick the same even if the clocks are initially synchronized. Each clock has its own proper time, and so does each object. Proper time is the time that would be shown by a very small clock if it were attached to the object as the object travels around. In the technical terminology of relativity theory, we say a clock measures the elapsed proper time between events that occur along its own worldline. A clock's correct proper time depends on the clock's history, in particular, its history of speed and gravitational influence. Synchronized clocks will not stay synchronized if they either move relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces. Relative to clocks that are stationary in the reference frame, clocks in motion in the frame run slower, as do clocks in stronger gravitational fields. So, clocks in cars driving by your apartment building run slower than your apartment’s clock. Ground floor clocks in your apartment building run slower than clocks in the top floor apartment, which is a direct reflection of the warping of time by matter. These effects on time by speed and gravitation are called time dilation effects. They affect all clocks, even biological ones.

Because every person has his or her own proper time, two persons can correctly assign different times to the same event. This difference is not just for events the persons themselves are involved in; it is times that they assign to any event in the universe. For example, if I am walking along the road and you drive by me toward the traffic signal ahead, then we will very nearly agree on the time at which the traffic signal changed color, but if we ask what event on a planet in the Andromeda Galaxy is simultaneous with the traffic signal's color change, we will disagree with each other by several weeks. This is yet another example of how relativistic effects usually do not arise in our everyday experience but only in extreme situations involving very high speeds, high-strength gravitational fields, or, in this example, extreme distances.

This situation with the Andromeda Galaxy is an example of how, for some pairs of events that are extremely distant from each other so that neither event could have had a causal effect upon the other, the theory of relativity does not put any time structure on the pair; one could happen first, the other could happen first, or they could be simultaneous, and only our imposition of a reference frame on the universe will force a decision on their temporal order.

According to special relativity, spacetime does not curve. According to general relativity spacetime does curve; and our spacetime is dynamic in the sense that any change in the amount and distribution of matter-energy will change the curvature; and this change is propagated at the speed of light, not instantaneously. Gravity is nothing but the warping of spacetime, and this warping can be detected in various ways, such as the ways by which we detect time dilation and space contraction.

One noteworthy point here is that, according to general relativity, although the presence of gravity implies spacetime curvature, not all spacetime curvature implies the presence of gravity. This is because a spacetime containing no mass can still have curvature; therefore, the geometry of spacetime is not always determined by the behavior of its matter. This point has been interpreted by many philosophers as a good reason to reject Leibniz's classical relationism.

See also What Else Science Requires of Time.

5. What Kinds of Time Travel are Possible?

Most scientists and philosophers of time agree that time travel to the future occurs very frequently, and travel to the past is allowed by Einstein’s general theory of relativity, although so far we have no evidence that travel to the past has occurred. There are many interesting arguments for why it cannot occur.

In order to explain, the term "time travel" needs clarification. We mean physical time travel, not psychological time travel, nor travel by dreaming of living in another time period. Here is David Lewis' well-accepted definition:

In any case of physical time travel, the traveler’s journey as judged by a correct clock attached to the traveler takes a different amount of time than the journey does as judged by a correct clock of someone who does not take the journey.

David Lewis' definition of time travel has no implications about whether, if you travel forward to the year 2276 or backward to 1776, you can suddenly pop into existence then, or instead must have traveled continuously through all the intervening years. If Lewis' definition is acceptable, then any requirement that rules out sudden appearance and demands spatiotemporal continuity will have to be supported by an additional argument. The argument that relativity theory requires this continuity is such an argument. According to relativity theory, if you travel forward to the year 2276, you cannot suddenly jump discontinuously into the future. Instead you must travel continually forward in both your personal time and the Earth’s external time, and you can be continuously observed from Earth’s telescopes during your voyage, although these Earth observers would notice that you are very slow about turning the pages in your monthly calendar.

One point to keep in mind is that even if a certain kind of time travel is logically possible, it does not follow that it is physically possible. Our understanding of what is physically possible about time travel comes primarily from the implications of Einstein’s general theory of relativity. This theory has never failed any of its many experimental tests, so most experts trust its implications for time travel.

However, there are many kinds of universes that are models of the equations of general relativity. For example, the theory of relativity does not say whether the universe is finite or infinite in volume, nor what its overall curvature is, nor whether it has a multi-connected topology (like a doughnut). But it seems clear that our universe is a model of general relativity, and in it time travel is not only physically possible, but occurs frequently.

Einstein’s general theory of relativity permits travel to the past and travel to the future. First, let’s consider future time travel. There are two kinds of future time travel—either by moving at high speed or by taking advantage of the presence of an intense gravitational field.

Regarding time travel due to high speed, any motion produces time travel to the future (relative to the clocks of those who do not travel). That makes every bicycle be a time machine. The higher the speed, the more noticeable the time travel. By going at extremely high speed, you can return to Earth where you left and find that the year is now 2276 C.E. (as measured by a clock fixed to the Earth) while your personal clock measures that merely ten years have elapsed. Both clocks can be giving correct readings of the time.

You can participate in that future, not just view it. A relevant philosophical controversy is whether there can be time travel that changes the future. This is impossible, according to (Lewis 1976, 150). To affect the future, or even to bring the future into existence is not the same thing as to change it.

It is impossible to use high speed to visit the future of the world after your death. And even if you reverse your velocity, it is impossible to travel back to the time that you began your journey even if you can travel back to the place where you began.

As measured by an Earth-based clock, it takes a 100,000 years for light to travel across the Milky Way Galaxy, but if you took the same trip in a spaceship traveling at very near the speed of light, the trip might last only a year, as judged by your own clock. In principle, you have enough time to travel anywhere before you die. But you can never get to a place faster than unobstructed light can get there.

A second kind of future time travel is due to a difference in the strength of the gravitational field between two places. If you left Earth in a spaceship that flew close to a black hole and then returned, you could return to find that you now look as youthful as your grandchildren although you would be much older than them, as judged by their clocks. You will not, however, be more biologically youthful than the you who stepped into the spaceship.

How about travel to the past? The desire to travel back in time is surely the child of remorse. Backward time travel is not allowed by either Newton's physics or Einstein's special theory of relativity, but general theory of relativity offers more hope since that theory does not clearly rule it out. For an easy illustration in a physically possible universe very unlike our own, imagine a Minkowski two-dimensional spacetime diagram written on a square sheet of paper, with one dimension of space going, say, right on the page. Each point represents a two-dimensional event. The time dimension points, say, up the page, at right angles to the space dimension. The origin is at the center of the page. Now bend the page into a cylinder so that the future meets the past. In this universe, any object that persists long enough will arrive into its past. It will participate in that past, but not change the past because there can be no erasing of events from the page, either those in the past or those in the future. If any kind of past time travel occurs, it will never enable the traveler to erase present facts.

In 1949, Kurt Gödel convinced Albert Einstein that in some unusual worlds that obey the equations of general relativity—you the time traveler, if you accelerate sufficiently, can continually travel forward in your personal time but eventually arrive into your own past.

In our own universe, there is no indication that time travel to the past has ever occurred. However, this does not rule out the possibility that in the future we will successfully create a time machine or time travel situation. (Thorne 1994) shows how a time machine would be created when matter is rearranged to produce a wormhole, but it is currently not technologically feasible to build a wormhole.

When we speak of our time traveling to the future, we travel to someone else's future but not to our own future. However, we seem to be able, in principle, to travel to our own past. Unfortunately, say nearly all philosophers and scientists, even if you do travel to your own past, you will not do anything that has not already been done, or else there would be a contradiction. In fact, if you do go back, you would already have been back there. For this reason, if you go back in time and try to kill your grandfather before he conceived a child, you will fail no matter how hard you try. You will fail because you have failed.

The metaphysician David Lewis believes you can in one sense kill your grandfather but cannot in another sense. You can, relative to a set of facts that does not include the fact that your grandfather survived to have children. You cannot, relative to a set of facts that does include this fact. The metaphysician Donald C. Williams disagrees, and argues that we always need to make our “can” statement relative to all the available facts. Lewis is saying you can and can’t, and you can but won’t. Williams is saying simply that you can’t, so you won’t. For a discussion of this disagreement, see (Fisher, 2015).

Here are a variety of brief philosophical arguments against past-directed time travel.

  1. Time travel is impossible because, if it were possible, we should have seen many time travelers by now, but nobody has encountered any time travelers.
  2. You could go back in time and kill your grandfather, but then you wouldn’t be born and so could not go back in time and kill your grandfather. That’s a logical contradiction.
  3. If past time travel were possible, then you could be in two different bodies at the same time, which is metaphysically impossible.
  4. If you were to go back to the past, then you would have been fated to go back because you already did, and this rules out free will. Yet we do have free will, so travel to the past is metaphysically impossible.
  5. If past time travel were possible, then you could die before you were born, which is metaphysically impossible.
  6. If you were presently to go back in time, then your present events would cause past events, which violates our concept of causality.
  7. If there were time travel, then when time travelers go back and attempt to change history, they must always botch their attempts to change anything, and it will appear to anyone watching them at the time as if Nature is conspiring against them. Since observers have never witnessed this apparent conspiracy of Nature, there probably cannot be time travel.
  8. Travel to the past is impossible because it allows the gaining of information for free. Here is a possible scenario. Buy a copy of Darwin's book The Origin of Species, which was published in 1859. In the 21st century, enter a time machine with it, go back to 1855 and give the book to Darwin himself. He could have used your copy in order to write his manuscript which he sent off to the publisher. If so, who first came up with the knowledge about evolution? Neither you nor Darwin. This is free information. Because this scenario contradicts what we know about where knowledge comes from, past-directed time travel isn't really possible.
  9. If past time travel is possible, then according to the philosopher John Earman, it should be possible for a rocket ship to carry a time machine capable of launching a probe (perhaps a smaller rocket) into its recent past which eventually reunites with the mother ship. The mother ship is programmed to launch the probe at a certain time unless a safety switch is on at that time. Suppose the safety switch is programmed to be turned on if and only if the “return” or “impending arrival” of the probe is detected by a sensing device on the mother ship. Does the probe get launched? It seems to be launched if and only if it is not launched.

These complaints about travel to the past are a mixture of arguments that past-directed time travel is not logically possible, metaphysically possible, physically possible, technologically possible, and probable, given today's empirical evidence. Counters to all of these arguments have been suggested by advocates of time travel. For example, a counter to the first argument is that perhaps we have seen no time travelers because we live in a boring era of little interest to travelers who have time machines.

If time were two-dimensional, we probably could travel back in time, analogously to how we can get back to the starting point of our run around a two-dimensional, oval race track. But time is not two-dimensional.

For more discussion of time travel, see the encyclopedia article “Time Travel.”

6. Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)

Substantivalism says space and time are like a container in which matter exists and moves independently of the container. Relationism is the thesis that space and time are not like this.  If you take away the matter and its motion, you take away the container.

Let’s leave aside the metaphor of the container and the contained, and more carefully describe substantivalism and relationism.

Substantivalism is the thesis that space and time exist independently of physical material and its events.

Relationism is the thesis that space is only a set of relationships among existing physical material, and time is a set of relationships among the events of that physical material.

One implication is that relationism and substantivalism cannot both be true.  Another implication of substantivalism is that time exists even if there are no physical events. There can be “empty time.” Relationism does not allow empty time. It says time requires change.

Everyone agrees time cannot be measured without there being changes, because we measure time by observing changes in some property or other such as the physical location of the hands of the clock, but the present issue is whether time exists without changes.

We need to be clearer about what we mean by “changes” when we say the dispute between substantivalists and relationists is over whether time does or doesn’t exist without changes. The word “change” is used in the ordinary sense of an object changing its properties over time. If a house changes its properties over space, by being red here and white there, this is not ordinary change. And it is also not ordinary change when the death of Queen Anne changes by moving farther into the past.

If Ludwig Boltzmann changes his mind from liking Joseph Loschmidt to disliking him, does that count as an ordinary change? No, not if Cartesian dualism is correct, but yes if most philosophers of mind are correct because Boltzmann's mind cannot change without a spatio-temporal change in Boltzmann’s brain.

We also need to be clearer about what the word “properties” means when speaking of an object changing its properties over time. For the relational theory, the term "property" is intended to exclude what Nelson Goodman called grue-like properties. Let us define an object to be grue if and only if it is green before the beginning of the year 1888 but is blue thereafter. With this definition, we can conclude that the world’s chlorophyll underwent a change from grue to non-grue in 1888. We’d naturally react to drawing this conclusion by saying that this change in chlorophyll is not a “real change” or “ordinary change” in the chlorophyll.

Classical substantival theories are also called "absolute theories." Unfortunately, the term "absolute" is used in other ways in philosophy. A second sense of "to be absolute" is to be immutable, or changeless. A third sense is to be independent of observer or reference frame. Although Einstein’s theory implies that time is not absolute in the sense of being independent of reference frame, it is an open question whether relativity theory undermines substantivalism.

a. History of the Debate before Einstein

Let's turn now to the history of the debate between the proponents and opponents of relationism about time.

The first advocate of a relational theory was Aristotle. He said, “neither does time exist without change” (Physics, book IV, chapter 11, page 218b). Plato had envisioned time as being substance-like, with time being an eternity that is measured by heavenly motion. Aristotle, on the other hand, envisioned time as not being substance-like but rather as being a property of motion, a measure of motion. The difference is between time being measured by motion and motion being measured by time. Plato’s position is a predecessor of Newton’s substantivalism, and Aristotle’s position is a predecessor of Leibniz’s relationism.

The battle lines between substantivalism and relationism were more clearly drawn in the early 18th century when Leibniz argued for the relational position against Newton, who had adopted a substantival theory of time. Newton's actual equations of motion and his law of gravity are consistent with both relationism and substantivalism, although this point was not clear at the time to either Leibniz or Newton.

In the 17th century, the English physicist Isaac Barrow rejected Aristotle’s and Leibniz's linkage between time and change. Barrow said time is something which exists independently of change and which existed even before God created the matter in the universe. Barrow’s student, Isaac Newton, agreed with this substantival theory of time. Although it is not clear what Newton’s own position was, Newton's followers argued very specifically that time and space are like an infinitely large arena or container for all events, and that the container exists with or without the events. He added that time (and space) are not primary substances, but are like primary substances in not being dependent on anything except God. For Newton, God chose some instant at which to create the world of physical objects, each having some velocity. From these initial conditions, the laws took over and guided the objects.

Gottfried Leibniz objected. He was suspicious of Newton's absolute time because it seemed to him to be undetectable. He argued that time is not an entity existing independently of actual events. He insisted that Newton had under-emphasized the fact that time necessarily involves an ordering of events. This is why time “needs” events, so to speak. Leibniz added that this overall order is time. So, he advocated relationism and rejected Newton's substantivalism.

One of Leibniz’s criticisms of Newton’s theory of absolute space and absolute time is that it violates a law of metaphysics that is now called Leibniz’s Law of the Identity of Indiscernibles: If two things or situations cannot be discerned by their different properties, then they are really just one and not two. Newton’s absolute theory violates this law, Leibniz said, because it implies that a world shifted in absolute space to a new location is a new world. Ditto for a time shift. For example, Newton’s theory implies that if God had moved the entire world 5 kilometers east and its history 5 minutes earlier, yet changed no properties of the objects nor relationships among the objects, then this would have been a different world. After all, there is nothing to distinguish one point from another in absolute space. But since there would be no discernible difference in the two worlds, Leibniz charged, there is just one world here, not two, and so Newton’s theory of absolute space and time is faulty.

Leibniz also criticized Newton's theory because it violates Leibniz's Law of Sufficient Reason: that there is a reason why anything is the way it is. Leibniz complained that, if God shifted the world 5 kilometers east or 5 minutes earlier but made no other changes, then He could have no reason to do so.

Newton's response was two-fold. First, he said Leibniz is correct that we cannot directly observe absolute space and time, and he is correct to accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason, yet the Principle does not require there to be sufficient reasons for humans; God might have had His own reason for creating the universe at a given place and time even though mere mortals cannot comprehend His reasons. Maybe God doesn't want to shift the universe five minutes earlier.

Second, regarding Leibniz’s complaint using the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, Newton suggested God is able to discern differences in absolute time that mere mortals cannot. Newton later admitted to friends that his two-part theological response was weak. Historians of philosophy generally agree.

If Newton had said no more, he would have lost the debate. However, Newton found a much better argument. Here is how to detect absolute space indirectly, he said. Suppose we tie a bucket’s handle to a rope hanging down from a tree branch. Partially fill the bucket with water, grasp the bucket, and, without spilling any water, rotate it many times until the rope is twisted. Don’t let go of the bucket. When everything quiets down, the water surface is flat and there is no relative motion between the bucket and its water. That is situation 1. Now let go of the bucket, and let it spin until there is once again no relative motion between the bucket and its water. At this time, while the bucket is spinning, there will be a maximum concave curvature of the water surface. That is situation 2.

How can a relational theory explain the difference in the shape of the water's surface in the two situations? It cannot, says Newton. If we ignore our hands, the rope, the tree, and the rest of the universe, says Newton, each situation is simply a bucket with still water; the situations appear to differ only in the shape of the surface. A relationist such as Leibniz cannot account for the difference in shape.

Newton said that even though Leibniz’s theory would fail to explain the difference in shape, his own theory could. He said that when the bucket is not spinning, there is no motion relative to space itself, that is, to absolute space; but, when it is spinning, there is motion relative to space itself, and so space itself exerts a force on the water to make the concave shape. This force is called "centrifugal force," and its presence is a way to detect absolute space.

Leibniz and his allies had no rebuttal. So, for over two centuries after this argument was created, Newton’s absolute theory of space and time was generally accepted by European scientists and philosophers.

One hundred years later, Kant entered the arena on the side of Newton. In a space containing only a single glove, said Kant, Leibniz could not account for its being a right-handed glove versus a left-handed glove because all the internal relationships would be the same in each of the two situations. However, intuitively we all know that there is a real difference between a right and a left glove, so this difference can only be due to the glove’s relationship to space itself. But if there is a “space itself,” then the absolute or substantival theory of space is better than the relational theory. This results suggests that the absolute theory of time is better, too.

Newton’s theory of time was dominant in the 18th and 19th centuries, even though during those centuries Huygens, George Berkeley, and Ernst Mach had entered the arena on the side of Leibniz. Near the end of the 19th century, Mach argued that it must be the remaining matter in the universe, such as the "fixed" stars, which causes the water surface in the bucket to be concave, and that without these stars or other matter, a spinning bucket would have a flat surface. Newton was incorrect, said Mach, to rely so much on his intuition that spinning buckets of water must always have concave surfaces.

In 1969, the philosopher Sydney Shoemaker presented a thought experiment in favor of Newton and substantivalism. It was an original argument attempting to establish, not that time exists without change, but the understandability of time existing without change. With the following scenario, we all can understand how empty time could exist, says Shoemaker. Divide all space into three disjoint regions, called region 3, region 4, and region 5. In region 3, change ceases every third year for one year. People in regions 4 and 5 can verify this and then convince the people in region 3 of it after they come back to life at the end of their frozen year. Similarly, change ceases in region 4 every fourth year for a year; and change ceases in region 5 every fifth year. Every sixty years—that is, every 3 x 4 x 5 years—all three regions freeze simultaneously for a year. In year sixty-one, everyone comes back to life, time having marched on for a year with no change. A year of empty time. Note that even if Shoemaker’s scenario successfully shows that the notion of empty time is understandable, it is not designed to show that empty time actually exists.

b. History of the Debate after Einstein

In the early 20th century, Einstein and the philosopher Hans Reichenbach declared the special theory of relativity to be a victory for the relational theory. Special relativity, they said, ruled out a space-filling ether, the leading candidate for substantival space, so the substantival theory was incorrect.

The relationist response to Newton’s bucket argument is to note Newton’s error in not considering the distant environment, as Mach had suggested. Einstein initially agreed with Mach that a body’s inertial mass comes from its interaction with all the other bodies in the universe and not with its interaction with space itself. So, if you hold Newton's bucket still but spin the background stars, then the water will creep up the side of the bucket and form a concave surface because the bucket is rotating with respect to the center of mass of the galaxy and not because the bucket is rotating with respect to substantival space.

There is "substantival" in the sense of independent of reference frame and also in the sense of independent of events. Only the first sense is ruled out when we reject a space-filling ether. But regarding the second sense, either there is no substance, in which case relationism is still correct, or there is a substance, namely spacetime itself, but this substance can no longer be independent of its matter, because, as John Wheeler quipped, “Spacetime tells matter how to move,” so again relationism is vindicated since there is no clear distinction between container and the contents it contains.

Despite these arguments for relationism, substantivalism can be defended in various ways.

One way is by redefining the term “spacetime” and the phrase “the matter is removed” and giving a realist interpretation of the general theory of relativity, while assuming that the metric of spacetime is not essential to spacetime. Relativity theory, as it is usually presented, says there is a four-dimensional continuous manifold of point-events, points that do not endure over time. To this manifold, it adds a metric field and a matter field. The metric field specifies, among other things, the intervals between points, and thus the spatial distances and temporal durations and certain geometrical properties. The metric field is often included explicitly or implicitly in the definition of “spacetime.” The Standard Model of Particle Physics, which includes the general theory of relativity, adds that there are twelve matter fields, not one, because there is an electron field, a quark field, and so forth. The new definition of “spacetime” is that spacetime is only the manifold. This is the substance of the new substantivalism, which is why it is often called “manifold substantivalism.” The manifold is the container that contains matter; and it is what continues to exist after the matter is removed.

The new meaning of the term “the matter is removed” is that the values of the matter fields are zero at each point. The physical theory does not allow any of the matter fields to stop existing merely because their value at each point might be zero. Nor do the metric field and manifold stop existing when the matter fields have these values. So, it can be said that with this terminology, spacetime continues to exist even though the matter it contains is removed, and in this way substantivalism is rescued.

However, by having no metric field, this spacetime does not specify for each event which other events are in its past and which events are in its future. But perhaps the loss of this intuitive feature of spacetime is an acceptable loss in order to save substantivalism.

Another kind of substantivalism says that spacetime is not just the manifold but rather is a combination of the manifold plus a single, essential metrical structure. Yet another position is that the debate between substantivalism and relationism no longer makes sense given the new terminology of the general theory of relativity. The very distinction between spacetime and event in spacetime, or between space and matter, has broken down. Yet other philosophers of physics see this break down as a vindication of at least the “spirit” of relationism. For more discussion of these technical points, see (Dainton, 2010, chapter 21).

7. McTaggart's A-Theory and B-Theory

In 1908, the English philosopher J. M. E. McTaggart proposed two ways of linearly ordering all events in time. The resulting ordering is the same, but the methods by which the ordering is created are different.

Longer lasting events can be considered to be composed of their point events. Let a and b be two point events that occur in the past, but in which a is farther in the past and so occurs first. Using the standard time diagram with time increasing to the right along a horizontal line, event a in McTaggart's B-series will be ordered to the left of event b because a happens before b. But when ordering the same two events into McTaggart's A-series, event a is ordered to the left of b for a different reason—because event a is more in the past than event b, or has more pastness than b. Here is a picture of the ordering, with c being another point event that happens later than a and b.


There are many other events that are located within the series at event a's location, namely all events simultaneous with event a.

McTaggart himself believed the A-series is paradoxical [for reasons that will not be explored in this article], but McTaggart also believed the A-properties (such as being past) are essential to our current concept of time, so for this reason he believed our current concept of time is incoherent. This reasoning is sometimes called "McTaggart's Paradox."

Let's suppose that event c occurs in our present and after events a and b. The information that c occurs in the present is not contained within either the A-series or the B-series itself. However, the information that c is in the present is used to create the A-series; it tells us to place c to the right of b because all present events go to the right of past events. The information that c is a present event is not used to create the B-series. The B-series places event c to the right of b just from the information that b happens before c.

Metaphysicians dispute whether the A-theory or instead the B-theory is the correct theory of reality. The A-theory comprises two theses, each of which is contrary to the B-theory: (1) The A-series is fundamental. Time is basically constituted by an A-series in which any event's being in the past (or in the present or in the future) is an intrinsic, objective, monadic property of the event itself and is not merely a subjective relation between the event and us, or between the event and the context of our utterance. (2) The second thesis of the A-theory is that events change. In 1908, McTaggart described the special way that events change:

Take any event—the death of Queen Anne, for example—and consider what change can take place in its characteristics. That it is a death, that it is the death of Anne Stuart, that it has such causes, that it has such effects—every characteristic of this sort never changes.... But in one respect it does change. It began by being a future event. It became every moment an event in the nearer future. At last it was present. Then it became past, and will always remain so, though every moment it becomes further and further past.

This special change is called secondary change and second-order change and also McTaggartian change.

The B-theory disagrees with both thesis (1) and thesis (2) of the A-theory. According to the B-theory, the B-series and not the A-series is fundamental; fundamental temporal properties are relational, not monadic; McTaggartian change is not an objective change and so is not metaphysically fundamental. The B-theory implies that an event's property of occurring in the past (or occurring twenty-three minutes ago, or now, or in a future century) is relational because it is merely a subjective relation between the event and us. When analyzed, it will be seen to make reference to our own perspective on the world. Queen Anne's death has the property of occurring in the past because it occurs in our past as opposed to, say, Aristotle's past; and it occurs in our past rather than our present or our future because it occurs at a time that is less than the time of occurrence of some event that we (rather than Aristotle) would say is occurring. The B-theory is committed to there being no objective distinction among past, present and future.

The B-theorists complain that thesis (1) of the A-theory implies that an event’s being in the present is an intrinsic, monadic property of the event, not a binary property between the event and a person, so this implies that if an event is present, then it is present for everybody. That implication violates the special theory of relativity because an event can be present for one person but not for another person who is moving relative to the first person. So, being present is relative and not an intrinsic, monadic property of the event. Being present is relative to reference frame. An event's being present in a given reference frame is a better candidate for an intrinsic, monadic property of the event, say the B-theorists.

When discussing the A-theory and the B-theory, metaphysicians often speak of an

  • A-series and B-series
  • A-theory and B-theory
  • A-theorist and B-theorist
  • A-facts and B-facts
  • A-terms and B-terms
  • A-properties and B-properties
  • A-predicates and B-predicates
  • A-statements and B-statements
  • A-camp and B-camp.

Here are some examples. B-series terms are relational terms; a B-term refers to a property of a pair of events such as “is earlier than,” “happens twenty-three minutes after,” and “was simultaneous with.” An A-theory term is monadic; it refers to a one-place property of a single event, not a pair of events: "in the near future," "happened twenty-three minutes ago," and "is present." The B-theory terms represent distinctively B-properties; the A-theory terms represent distinctively A-properties. The B-fact that event a occurs before event b will always be a fact, but the A-fact that event a occurred about an hour ago soon won’t be a fact. Similarly, the A-statement that event a occurred about an hour ago, if true, will soon become false. However, B-facts are not transitory, and B-statements are eternal, they have fixed truth values. For the B-theorist, the statement "The event of snowing occurs an hour before this act of utterance" will, if true, stay true forever. The A-theory usually says A-facts are the truthmakers of true A-statements and so A-facts are ontologically fundamental; the B-theorist, at least a B-theorist who believes in facts, appeals instead to B-facts. According to a classical B-theory, when the A-theorist correctly says, "It began snowing an hour ago," what really makes it true is not that the snowing has an hour of pastness but that the event of uttering the sentence occurs an hour after the event of it beginning to snow. Notice that "occurs an hour after" is a B-term.

When you like an event, say yesterday’s snowfalling, then change your mind and dislike the event, what sort of change of the event is that? Well, this change in attitude is not a change that is intrinsic to the event itself. When your attitude changes, the snowfalling itself undergoes no intrinsic change, only a change in its relationship to you. A-theorists prefer to focus on the second-order change of what they consider to be intrinsic properties of an event, such as its being past. They point out that the snowfalling event will change tomorrow by being even more past. And this second-order change occurs regardless of whether your attitude toward the event changes.

Members of the A-camp and B-camp recognize that ordinary speakers are not careful in their use of A and B terminology; but, when the terminology is used carefully, each camp member believes their camp's terminology can best explain the terminology of the other camp.

8. Does Time Flow?

Time seems to flow, in two senses. First, future events eventually become present events and then become past events, just like a boat-event that drifts past us on the riverbank and then recedes farther and farther from us. Second, in the converse sense, we flow into the future and leave past events ever farther behind us. This is the sense that the philosopher George Santayana offered in 1938 when he said, “The essence of nowness runs like fire along the fuse of time.”

Time definitely seems to flow, but there is philosophical disagreement about whether it really does. This issue is about physical time, not merely psychological time, and it is directly related to whether McTaggart's A-theory or B-theory is more fundamental.

There are two primary theories about time’s flow: (A) the flow is objectively real. (B) the flow is either a myth or else is merely subjective. Often theory A is called the dynamic theory or the A-theory; and often theory B is called the static theory or B-theory or myth-of-passage theory.

The B theory implies that the flow is the product of a faulty metaphor. The defense of that charge often proceeds like this. Time exists, things change, and so we say time “elapses,” but time itself does not change. It does not change by flowing. The present does not objectively flow or move into the past because the present is not an objective feature of the world. We all experience this flow, but only in the sense that we all frequently misinterpret our experience.

One point offered in favor of the B-theory is to ask about the rate at which time flows. It would be a rate of one second per second. But that is silly, it is claimed. One second divided by one second is the unit-less number one. That is not a coherent rate.

In another sense of “rate” and of “flow,” there definitely can be different rates for time. According to the special theory of relativity, if I move at a high speed away from you, then you will judge that my time elapses at a slower rate than your time. Physicists sometimes speak of this situation as one in which time flows differently for different observers. However, this is not the sense of flow being promoted by dynamic theories of time.

Physicists sometimes speak of time flowing in another sense of the term "flow." This is the sense in which change is continuous rather than discrete. Again, this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers have in mind when debating the objectivity of time's flow.

Physicists sometimes carelessly speak of time flowing when all they mean is that time elapses, that is, exists. They also carelessly speak of time flowing in yet another sense—when what they mean is that time has an arrow, a direction, from the past to the future. But again this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers use when speaking of the dynamic theory of time's flow.

There is no doubt that time seems to pass. There surely is some objective feature of our brains, say the proponents of the static theories, that causes us to mistakenly believe there is a flow of time which we are experiencing. Perhaps it is due to the objective fact that we have different perceptions at different times and that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences.

According to the dynamic theories, the flow of time is objective. It is a feature of our mind-independent reality, and is an intrinsic property of time. A dynamic theory is closer to common sense, and has historically been the more popular theory among philosophers. It is more likely to be adopted by those who believe that McTaggart's A-series is a fundamental feature of time but his B-series is not.

There are several kinds of dynamic theory. One dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being future, to being present, to being past, and they also change in their degree of pastness and degree of presentness. This kind of change is often called McTaggart's second-order change to distinguish it from more ordinary, first-order change as when a leaf changes from a green state to a brown state. For the B-theorist, the only proper kind of change is when different states of affairs obtain at different times. Proponents of the A-theory and of the B-theory agree that an event, say World War I, is changing its relationships to us, for example because some of us today are learning more about the war; but the two theories disagree about whether World War I is undergoing an intrinsic change, not just a change in relationship to us.

Opponents of the dynamic theory complain that when events are said to change, the change is not a real change in the event’s essential, intrinsic properties, but only in the event’s relationship to the observer. They complain that saying the death of Queen Anne is an event that changes from present to past is no more of an objectively real change in her death than saying her death changed from being approved of to being disapproved of. This extrinsic change in approval is not intrinsic to her death and so does not count as an objectively real change in her death, and neither does the so-called second-order change of her death from being present to being past. Attacking the notion of time’s flow in this manner, Adolf Grünbaum said: “Events simply are or occur…but they do not ‘advance’ into a pre-existing frame called ‘time.’ … An event does not move and neither do any of its relations.”

A second dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being indeterminate in the future to being determinate in the present and past. Time’s flow is really events becoming determinate, so these dynamic theorists speak of time’s flow as "temporal becoming."

A third dynamic theory says time's flow is the coming into existence of facts, the actualization of new states of affairs; but, unlike the first two dynamic theories, there is no commitment to events changing. This is the theory of flow that is usually accepted by advocates of presentism.

A fourth dynamic theory suggests the flow is (or is reflected in) the change over time of truth values of declarative sentences. For example, suppose the sentence, “It is now raining,” was true during the rain yesterday but has changed to false today, which is sunny. That's an indication that time flowed from yesterday to today, and these sorts of truth value changes are at the root of the flow. In response, critics of this dynamic theory suggest that the temporal indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” has no truth value because the reference of the word “now” is unspecified. If it cannot have a truth value, it cannot change its truth value. However, the sentence is related to a sentence that does have a truth value, the sentence with the temporal indexical replaced by the date that refers to a specific time and with the other indexicals replaced by names of whatever they refer to. Supposing it is now midnight here on April 1, 2017, and the speaker is in Sacramento, California, then the indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” is intimately related to the more complete or context-explicit sentence, “It is raining at midnight on April 1, 2017 in Sacramento, California.” Only these latter, non-indexical, non-context-dependent, complete sentences have truth values, and these truth values do not change with time, so they do not underlie any flow of time. Fully-described events do not change their properties and so time does not flow because complete or "eternal" sentences do not change their truth values.

Another dynamic theory adds to the block-universe a flowing present which "spotlights" or makes vivid a new present slice of the block at every moment. This is often called the moving spotlight view.

John Norton (Norton 2010) argues that time's flow is objective but so far is beyond the reach of our understanding. Tim Maudlin argues that the objective flow of time is fundamental and unanalyzable. He is happy to say “time does indeed pass at the rate of one hour per hour” (Maudlin 2007, p. 112).

9. What are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?

a. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism and the Block-Universe

Have dinosaurs slipped out of existence? More generally, we are asking whether the past is part of reality. How about the future? Philosophers are divided on the ontological question of the reality of the past, the present, and the future. There are three leading theories. (1): According to the ontological theory called presentism, if something is real, then it is real now; all and only things that exist now are real. The presentist maintains that the past and the future are not real, so if a statement about the past is true, this must be because some present facts make it true. Heraclitus, Duns Scotus, Thomas Hobbes, and A. N. Prior are presentists.

(2): Advocates of a growing-past agree with the presentists that the present is special ontologically, but they argue that, in addition to the present, the past is also real and is growing bigger all the time. C. D. Broad, George Ellis, Richard Jeffrey, and Michael Tooley have defended this view. They claim the past and present are real, but the future is not real. William James famously remarked that the future is so unreal that even God cannot anticipate it. It is not clear whether Aristotle accepted the growing-past theory or accepted a form of presentism; see (Putnam 1967, p. 244) for commentary on this issue.

(3): Proponents of eternalism oppose both presentism and the growing-past theory—but not because they believe reality is composed of the past, present, and future. Rather, the eternalists object to assigning special ontological status to the past, the present, or the future. Advocates of eternalism do not deny the reality of the events that we classify as being in our past, present or future, but they say there is no objective ontological difference between present and future, just as there is no objective ontological difference between here and there. The difference is subjective, depending upon which person's experience is being implicitly referred to. Yes, we thank goodness that the threat to our safety is there rather than here, and that it is past rather than present, but these differences are subjective, being dependent on our point of view. Some eternalists say that because of the finite speed of light we can see distant objects only as they were in the past. We never see them as they are presently. Bertrand Russell, J. J. C. Smart, W. V. O. Quine, Adolf Grünbaum, and Paul Horwich have endorsed eternalism.

Eternalism is closely associated with the block-universe theory, as is the theory of four-dimensionalism. Four-dimensionalism implies that the ontologically basic objects in the universe are four-dimensional rather than three-dimensional. Four-dimensionalism plus the block theory is said to promote the "spatialization of time" because it treats time as a fourth dimension in a four-dimensional spacetime. For a graphic presentation, see a Minkowski diagram. If time has an infinite future or infinite past, or if space has an infinite extent, then the block is thereby infinitely large along those dimensions.

The block-universe theory implies that reality is a single block of spacetime with its time slices (its sheets of simultaneous events) ordered by the happens-before relation. We adults are composed of our infancy time-slices, plus our childhood time-slices, plus our teenage time-slices, plus our adult time-slices. Time-slices are also called "temporal parts."

For the eternalist, the block itself has no distinguished past, present, and future, but any chosen reference frame can be assigned its own definite past, present, and future. The future, by the way, is the actual future, not all possible futures. The philosopher William James coined the term “block universe.”

Some proponents of the growing-past theory have adopted a growing-block theory. They say that the future is not included in their block because it does not exist. The present moment is the latest moment within the block. The present is a three-dimensional time slice that divides the past from the nothingness of the future.

All three ontologies [namely, presentism, the growing-past, and eternalism] imply that at the present moment we only ever experience a part of the present. One of the major issues for presentism is how to ground true propositions about the past. What makes it true that U.S. President Abraham Lincoln was assassinated? In technical-ease we are asking what are the "truthmakers" of the true propositions and the "falsemakers" of the false propositions. Some presentists say past-tensed truths lack truthmakers but are nevertheless true. Most presentists will say what makes a tensed proposition true are only features of the present way things are. The eternalist disagrees. When someone says truly that Abraham Lincoln was assassinated, the eternalist believes this is to say something true of a real Abraham Lincoln who is not present. The block theorist might add that Lincoln is real but far away from us along the time dimension just as the Moon is real even though far away from us along a spatial dimension.

A second major issue for the presentist is to account for causation, for the fact that April showers caused May flowers. Normally, when causes occur, their effects are not yet present. A survey of defenses of presentism can be found in (Markosian 2003).

A third major issue for the presentist is to account for the Special Theory of Relativity's treatment of the present. That theory allows event a to be simultaneous with event b in some reference frame, and it allows be to be simultaneous with event c in some other reference frame. Yet in the first frame, c is in the future of a. So, if a is real, then shouldn’t the presentist allow c to be real also? This argument against presentism presupposes the transitivity of co-existence. (Stein 1991) says presentism can be retained by rejecting transitivity and saying what is present and thus real is different depending on your spacetime location. For event a, the only events that are real are those with a zero interval from a.

The presentist and the advocate of the growing-past will usually unite in opposition to eternalism on four grounds: (i) The present is so much more vivid to a conscious being than are memories of past experiences and expectations of future experiences. (ii) Eternalism misses the special “open” and changeable character of the future. In the classical block-universe theory promoted by most eternalists (as opposed to non-classical versions that say the block splits into multiple blocks for each quantum possibility at each instant), there is only one future, so this implies the future exists already; but we know this determinsm is incorrect because it denies libertarian free will. (iii) A present event "moves" in the sense that it is no longer present a moment later, having lost its property of presentness. (iv) Future-tensed statements that are contingent do not have truthmakers.

The counter from the defenders of eternalism and the block-universe is that, regarding (i), the vividness of here does not imply the unreality of there. Regarding (ii) and the open future, the block theory allows determinism and fatalism but does not require either one. Eventually there will be one future, regardless of whether that future is now open or closed, and that is what constitutes the future portion of the block. Finally, don't we all fear impending doom? But according to presentism and the growing-block theory, why should we have this fear if the doom is known not to exist, as these two kinds of theorists evidently believe? The best philosophy of time will not make our different attitudes toward future danger and past danger be so mysterious.

The advocates of the block-universe attack both presentism and the growing-past theory by claiming that only the block-universe can make sense of the special theory of relativity’s implication that, if persons A and B are separated but in relative motion, an event in person A’s present can be in person B’s future. Advocates of presentism and the growing-past theories must suppose that this event is both real and unreal because it is real for A but not real for B. Surely that conclusion is unacceptable, claim the eternalists. Two key assumptions of this argument are, first, that relativity does provide an accurate account of the spatiotemporal relations among events, and, second, that if there is some frame of reference in which two events are simultaneous, then if one of the events is real, so is the other.

Opponents of the block-universe counter that block theory does not provide an accurate account of the way things are because the block theory considers the present to be subjective, and not part of objective reality, yet the present is known to be part of objective reality. If science doesn't use the concept of the present in its basic laws, then this is one of science's faults. For a review of the argument from relativity against presentism, and for some criticisms of the block theory, see (Putnam 1967) and (Saunders 2002).

b. Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?

Suppose you look at your correct clock near you in your apartment building on Earth and notice it is shows midnight. What time is it on the Moon? Well, midnight, of course. But what event on the Moon is simultaneous with midnight on Earth? You can't look and see immediately. You will have to wait 1.3 seconds at least because it takes light that long to reach from the Moon to the Earth. If an asteroid were to strike the Moon, and you were to see the strike through your Earth telescope at 1.3 seconds after midnight, then you could compute later that the asteroid striking the Moon was simultaneous with your clock showing midnight. If you want to know what is presently happening on the other side of Milky Way, you'll have an even longer wait. So, the moral is that whatever collection of events is in your present is something you have to compute; you cannot just look and see at one time.

Einstein's theory of relativity implies that, if someone judges time using a clock fixed to their spaceship that is flying over your apartment building at a significant fraction of the speed of light, then when your clock shows it is now midnight, the collection of events that you eventually compute and so can correctly say occurs now must be different than the collection of events that the space traveler will be able to say occurs now, and the difference grows greater the father away that the events occur from Earth. The implication is that nobody's now is the only correct one. We all have our nows, and they are as valid as the next person's. But for people on Earth who aren't moving fast relative to each other, we more or less all share the same now. That is, we all can eventually agree on our computations about what events occur now. For further discussion of this point, see (Butterfield 1984).

All philosophers agree that we would be missing some important information if we did not know what time it is now, but these philosophers disagree over just what sort of information this is. Proponents of the objectivity of the present are committed to claiming the universe would have a present even if there were no conscious beings. This claim is controversial. For example, in 1915, Bertrand Russell objected to giving the present any special ontological standing:

In a world in which there was no experience, there would be no past, present, or future, but there might well be earlier and later. (Russell 1915, p. 212)

The principal argument for believing in the objectivity of the now is that the now is so much more vivid to everyone. If science does not explain this vividness, then there is a defect within science. A second argument points out that there is so much agreement among people around us about what is happening now and what is not. So, isn't that a sign that the concept of the now is objective, not subjective, and existent rather than non-existent? A third argument for objectivity of the now is that when we examine ordinary language we find evidence that a belief in the now is ingrained in our language. It is unlikely that it would be so ingrained if it were not correct to believe it.

Let's re-examine these arguments. One criticism of the argument from vividness is that the now is vivid but so is the "here," yet we don't conclude from this that the here is somehow objective geographically. Why then assume that the vividness of the now points to it being objective temporally? A second criticism is that we cannot now step outside our present experience and compare its vividness with experience now of future time and experience now of past times. Instead, when we speak of the "vividness" of our present experience of, say, a tree in front of us, we are really comparing our present experience of the tree with our dim memories of past trees and expectations of future trees. So, the comparison is unfair; the vividness of future events should be assessed by measuring those events and not merely by measuring expectations of those events.

A third criticism of the vividness argument points out that there are empirical studies by cognitive psychologists and neuroscientists showing that our judgment about what is vividly happening now is plastic and can be affected by our expectations and by what other experiences we are having at the time. For example, we see and hear a woman speaking to us from across the room; then we construct an artificial now in which hearing her speak and seeing her speak happen at the same time, whereas the acoustic engineer tells us we are mistaken because the sound traveled much slower than the light.

In any discussion about whether the now is objective, we need to remember that the term "objective" has different senses. There is objective in the sense of not being relative to the reference frame. But there is also objective in the sense of not being mind-dependent and in the sense of not being dependent upon which person we are talking about. Since being subjective is not being objective, there are multiple senses of being subjective.

According to McTaggart's A-camp, there is a global now shared by all of us. The now is objective in all the senses that were just mentioned. The B-camp disagrees and says this belief in a global now is a product of our falsely supposing that everything we see is happening now; we are not factoring in the finite speed of light. Proponents of the non-objectivity of the present frequently claim that a proper analysis of time talk should treat the phrases "the present" and "now" as indexical terms which refer to the time at which the phrases are uttered or written by the speaker, so their relativity to us speakers shows the essential subjectivity of the present.

There are interesting issues about the now even in theology. Norman Kretzmann has argued that if God is omniscient, then He knows what time it is, and to know this He must always be changing. Therefore, there is an incompatibility between God's being omniscient and God's being immutable. Thomas Aquinas, on the other hand, argues that God is unchanging and so is not in time.

c. Persist, Endure, Perdure, and Four-Dimensionalism

Some objects last longer than others. They persist longer. But there is philosophical disagreement about how to understand persistence. Objects considered four-dimensionally are said to persist by perduring rather than enduring. Think of events and processes as being four-dimensional. The familiar three-dimensional objects such as chairs and people are usually considered to exist wholly at a single time and are said to persist by enduring through time. Advocates of four-dimensionalism endorse perduring objects rather than enduring objects as the metaphysically basic entities. All events and processes are four-dimensional sub-blocks of the block-universe. The perduring object persists by being the sum or “fusion” of a series of its temporal parts (also called its temporal stages and temporal slices and time slices). For example, a thirty-five-year old man can be considered to be a four-dimensional perduring object consisting of his childhood, his middle age and his future old age. These are three of his infinitely many temporal parts.

One argument against four-dimensionalism is that it allows an object to have too many temporal parts. Four-dimensionalism implies that, during every second in which an object exists, there are at least as many temporal parts of the object as there are sub-segments of the mathematical line within the segment from zero to one. According to (Thomson 1983), this is too many parts for any object to have. She also says that as the present moves along, present temporal parts move into the past and go out of existence while some future temporal parts "pop" into existence, and she complains that this popping in and out of existence is implausible. The four-dimensionalist can respond to these complaints by remarking that the present temporal parts do not go out of existence when they are no longer in the present; instead, they simply do not presently exist. Similarly, dinosaurs have not popped out of existence; they simply do not exist presently. By removing talk of popping in and out, one removes the source of intuitive implausibility.

According to David Lewis in On the Plurality of Worlds, the primary argument for perdurantism is that it has an easy time of solving what he calls the problem of temporary intrinsics, of which the Heraclitus paradox is one example. The Heraclitus Paradox is the problem, first introduced by Heraclitus of ancient Greece, of explaining our not being able to step into the same river twice because the water is different the second time. The mereological essentialist agrees with Heraclitus, but our common sense says Heraclitus is mistaken. The advocate of endurance has trouble showing that Heraclitus is mistaken for the following reason: We do not step into two different rivers, do we? Yet the river has two different intrinsic properties, namely being two different collections of water; but, by Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, identical objects cannot have different properties. A 4-dimensionalist who advocates perdurance says the proper metaphysical analysis of the Heraclitus paradox is that we can step into the same river twice by stepping into two different temporal parts of the same 4-d river. Similarly, we cannot see a football game at a moment; we can see only a momentary temporal part of the 4-d game. For more discussion of this topic in metaphysics, see (Carroll and Markosian 2010, pp. 173-7).

Eternalism differs from 4-dimensionalism. Eternalism says the present, past, and future are equally real, whereas 4-dimensionalism says the basic objects are 4-dimensional. Most 4-dimensionalists accept eternalism and four-dimensionalism and McTaggart's B-theory.

One of A. N. Prior’s criticisms of the B-theory involves the reasonableness of our saying of some painful, past event, “Thank goodness that is over.” Prior says the B-theorist cannot explain this reasonableness because no B-theorist should thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance of "Thank goodness that is over," since that B-fact or B-relationship is timeless; it has always held and always will. The only way then to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness. But if so, then the A-theory is correct and the B-theory is incorrect.

One B-theorist response is discussed in a later section, but another response is simply to disagree with Prior that it is improper for a B-theorist to thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance, even though this is an eternal B-fact. Still another response from the B-theorist comes from the 4-dimensionalist who says that as 4-dimensional beings it is proper for us to care more about our later time-slices than our earlier time-slices. If so, then it is reasonable to thank goodness that the time slice at the end of the pain occurs before the time slice that is saying, "Thank goodness that is over." Admittedly this is caring about an eternal B-fact. So Prior’s premise [that the only way to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness] is a faulty premise, and Prior’s argument for the A-theory is invalid.

Four-dimensionalism has implications for the philosophical problem of personal identity. According to four-dimensionalism, you as a teenager and you as a child are not the same 3-dimensional person but rather are two different parts of the same 4-dimensional person.

d. Truth Values and Free Will

The philosophical dispute about presentism, the growing-past theory, and the block theory or eternalism has taken a linguistic turn by focusing upon a question about language: “Are predictions true or false at the time they are uttered?” Those who believe in the block-universe (and thus in the determinate reality of the future) will answer “Yes,” while a “No” will be given by presentists and advocates of the growing-past.

The issue is whether contingent sentences uttered now about future events are true or false now rather than true or false only in the future at the time the predicted event is supposed to occur. Proponents of the position that the sentences do have truth values now will appeal to their intuition that, if something has happened as specified in the sentence about the future, then, if we look back at the earlier time when the sentence is uttered, it was the case that it would happen. Not that they say "would happen" and not "must happen."

For example, suppose someone says, “Tomorrow the admiral will start a sea battle.” And suppose that tomorrow the admiral orders a sneak attack on the enemy ships which starts a sea battle. Advocates of the block-universe argue that, if so, then the above quoted sentence was true at the time it was uttered. Truth is eternal or fixed, they say, and “is true” is a timeless predicate, not one that merely says “is true now.” These philosophers point favorably to the ancient Greek philosopher Chrysippus who was convinced that a contingent sentence about the future is true or false. If so, the sentence cannot have any other value such as “indeterminate” or "neither true or false now."

Many other philosophers, usually in McTaggart's A-camp, agree with Aristotle's suggestion that the sentence is not true until it can be known to be true, namely at the time at which the sea battle occurs. The sentence was not true before the battle occurred. In other words, predictions have no (classical) truth values at the time they are uttered. Predictions fall into the “truth value gap.” This position that contingent sentences have no classical truth values is called the "doctrine of the open future" and also the "Aristotelian position" because many researchers throughout history have taken Aristotle to be holding the position in chapter 9 of On Interpretation—although today it is not so clear that Aristotle himself held the position.

One principal motive for adopting the Aristotelian position arises from the belief that, if sentences about future human actions are now true, then humans are determined to perform those actions, and so humans have no free will. To defend free will, we must deny truth values to predictions.

This Aristotelian argument against predictions being true or false has been discussed as much as any in the history of philosophy, and it faces a series of challenges. First, if there really is no free will, or if free will is compatible with determinism, then the motivation to deny truth values to predictions is undermined.

Second, according to many compatibilists, but not all, your choices do affect the world, and if it is true that you will perform an action in the future, it does not follow that now you will not perform it freely, nor that you are not free to do otherwise if your intentions were to change, but only that you will not do otherwise. For more on this point about modal logic, see Foreknowledge and Free Will.

A third challenge, from Quine and others, claims the Aristotelian position wreaks havoc with the logical system we use to reason and argue with predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument:

There will be a sea battle tomorrow.

If there will be a sea battle tomorrow, then we should wake up the admiral.

So, we should wake up the admiral.

Without the premises in this argument having truth values, that is, being true or false, we cannot properly assess the argument using the usual standards of deductive validity because this standard is about the relationships among truth values of the component sentences—that a valid argument is one in which it is impossible for the premises to be true and the conclusion to be false. Unfortunately, the Aristotelian position says that some of these component sentences are neither true nor false, so the Aristotelian position is implausible.

In reaction to this third challenge, proponents of the Aristotelian argument say that if Quine would embrace tensed propositions and expand his classical logic to a tense logic, he could avoid those difficulties in assessing the validity of arguments that involve sentences having future tense.

Quine has claimed that the analysts of our talk involving time should in principle be able to eliminate the temporal indexical words such as "now" and "tomorrow" because their removal is needed for fixed truth and falsity of our sentences [fixed in the sense of being eternal sentences whose truth values are not relative to the situation because the indexicals and indicator words have been replaced by times, places and names, and whose verbs are treated as timeless and tenseless], and having fixed truth values is crucial for the logical system used to clarify science. “To formulate logical laws in such a way as not to depend thus upon the assumption of fixed truth and falsity would be decidedly awkward and complicated, and wholly unrewarding,” says Quine.

Philosophers are still divided on the issues of whether only the present is real, what sort of deductive logic to use for reasoning about time, and whether future contingent sentences have truth values.

e. Are There Essentially-Tensed Facts?

Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way of locating an event in time. All the world’s cultures have a conception of time, but only half the world’s languages use tenses. The Chinese, Burmese and Malay languages have no tenses. The English language expresses conceptions of time with tensed verbs but also in other ways, such as with the adverbial phrases “now” and “twenty-three days ago,” and with the adjective phrases "brand-new" and "ancient," and with the prepositions "until" and "since."

Philosophers have asked what we are basically committed to when we use tense to locate an event in time. There are two principal answers: that tenses are objective and that they are subjective. The first answer is that tenses represent objective features of reality that are not captured by eternalism and the block-universe approach. This theory is said to "take tense seriously" and is called the tensed theory of time. The theory claims that when we learn the truth values of certain tensed sentences we obtain knowledge that tenseless sentences do not and cannot provide, for example, that such and such a time is the present time—that it is now noon. Tenses are almost the same as positions in McTaggart's A-series, so the tensed theory is commonly called the A-theory of tense.

A second, contrary answer to the question of the significance of tenses is that they are merely subjective. Our saying the event happened rather than is happening indicates that we said this after the event happened rather than before. This theory is the B-theory of tense.

The philosophical disagreement here is not so much about tenses in the grammatical sense, but rather about the significance of the distinctions of past, present, and future which those tenses are used to mark. The main metaphysical disagreement is about whether times and events have non-relational properties of pastness, presentness, and futurity. Does an event have or not have the property of, say, pastness independent of the event's relation to us and our temporal location? The A-camp says it does; the B-camp disagrees.

On the tenseless theory of time, whether the death of U. S. Lieutenant Colonel George Armstrong Custer occurred here depends on the speaker’s spatial relation to the death event. Is the speaker standing at the battle site in Montana, or sitting in Paris? Similarly, whether the death occurs now is equally subjective. It depends on the speaker's temporal relation to the event. That is, is the speaker hearing this in 1876 at the time the death event occurs or instead hearing this in the 21st century?

This controversy is often presented as a dispute about whether tensed facts exist, with advocates of the tenseless theory objecting to tensed facts and advocates of the tensed theory promoting them as essential. The primary function of tensed facts is to make tensed sentences true, to be their "truthmakers." For purposes of simplifying the discussion, let us uncritically accept the correspondence of truth, that true sentences are true because they correspond to the facts.

The A-theory and the B-theory disagree about what are the sorts of facts that are the truthmakers of a true, tensed sentence such as “Queen Anne of Great Britain died.” The A-theorist says the truthmaker is simply the fact that the death is past, that is has pastness. The B-theorist gives a more complicated answer by saying the truthmaker is the fact that the time of Queen Anne’s death is-less-than the time of uttering the original sentence. Notice that the B-answer’s fact does not use any words in the past tense. According to the classical B-theorist, the use of tense (and more importantly, appeal to tensed facts) is an extraneous and eliminable feature of our language, as is all use of the terminology of the A-series.

If you, yourself had uttered “Queen Anne of Great Brain died,” then your utterance would be true. If Julius Caesar had uttered it, then his utterance would have been false. So, the truth value of the sentence is context-dependent.

The proponent of the tenseless or B viewpoint does not deny the importance or coherence of talk about the past, but will deny that what makes the tensed sentence true is that it corresponds to a tensed fact or that the event has the monadic property of presentness. Instead, argues the B-theorist, the truthmaker of the sentence involves only tenseless facts. For example, John's assertion that the event of Custer's death occurred in the past might best be analyzed by the B-theorist as asserting that the time of the event of Custer's death is-less-than the time of the event of John's assertion of the sentence. Notice that the description of the B-theory's truthmaker does not use the past tense.

This B-theory analysis is challenged by proponents of the tensed A-theory on the grounds that it can succeed only for utterances or readings or inscriptions, but a sentence can be true even if never uttered or read or inscribed.

There are other challenges to the B-theory. Roderick Chisholm and A. N. Prior claim that the word “is” in the sentence “It is now midnight” is essentially present tensed because there is no adequate translation using only tenseless verbs. Trying to give a B-style analysis such as, “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is to miss the essential reference to the present in the original sentence because the original sentence is not always true, but the sentence “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is always true. So, the tenseless analysis fails. There is no escape from this criticism by adding “and t is now” because this last indexical phrase needs its own analysis, and we are starting a vicious regress.

(Prior 1959) supported the tensed A-theory by arguing that after experiencing a painful event,

one says, e.g., “Thank goodness that’s over,” and [this]…says something which it is impossible that any use of a tenseless copula with a date should convey. It certainly doesn’t mean the same as, e.g., “Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of that thing is Friday, June 15, 1954,” even if it be said then. (Nor, for that matter, does it mean “Thank goodness the conclusion of that thing is contemporaneous with this utterance.” Why should anyone thank goodness for that?).

D. H. Mellor and J. J. C. Smart agree that tensed talk is important for understanding how we think and speak—the temporal indexicals are essential, as are other indexicals—but they claim tensed talk is not essential for describing extra-linguistic reality. These two philosophers, and other philosophers who "do not take tense seriously," advocate a newer tenseless B-theory by saying the truth conditions of any tensed declarative sentence can be explained without tensed facts even if Chisholm and Prior are correct that some tensed sentences in English cannot be adequately translated into tenseless ones. [The truth conditions of a sentence are the conditions which must be satisfied in the world in order for the sentence to be true. The sentence "Snow is white" is true on the condition that snow is white. More particularly, it is true if whatever is referred to by the term 'snow' satisfies the predicate 'is white'. The conditions under which the conditional sentence "If it's snowing, then it's cold" are true are that it is not both true that it is snowing and false that it is cold. Other analyses are offered for the truth conditions of sentences that are more complex grammatically.]

According to the newer B-theory of Mellor and Smart, if I am speaking to you and say, "It is now midnight," then this sentence admittedly cannot be translated into tenseless terminology without loss of meaning, but the truth conditions can be explained fully with tenseless terminology. The truth conditions of "It is now midnight" are that my utterance occurs at the same time as your hearing the utterance, which in turn is the same time as when our standard clock declares the time to be midnight in our reference frame. In brief, it's true just in case it is uttered at midnight. Notice that no tensed facts are appealed to in the explanation of those truth conditions.

Similarly, an advocate of the new tenseless theory will say it is not the pastness of the painful event that explains why I say, “Thank goodness that’s over” after exiting the dentist's chair. I say it because I believe that the time of the occurrence of that utterance is greater than the time of the occurrence of the painful event, and because I am glad about this. Of course I'd be even gladder if there were no pain at any time. I may not be consciously thinking about the time of the utterance when I make it; nevertheless, that time is what helps explain what I am glad about.

In addition, it is claimed by Mellor and other new B-theorists that tenseless sentences can be used to explain the logical relations between tensed sentences; they can be used to explain why one tensed sentence implies another, is inconsistent with yet another, and so forth. According to this new theory of tenseless time, once it is established that the truth conditions of tensed sentences can be explained without utilizing tensed facts, then Ockham’s Razor is applied. If we can do without essentially-tensed facts, then we should say essentially-tensed facts do not exist.

To summarize, tensed facts were presumed by the A-theory to be needed to be the truthmakers for the truth of tensed talk; but the new B-theory analysis shows that ordinary tenseless facts are adequate. The B-theory concludes that we should "not take tense seriously" in the sense of requiring tensed facts to account for the truth and falsity of sentences involving tenses because tensed facts are not needed. Proponents of the tensed theory of time do not agree with this conclusion. So, the philosophical debate continues over whether tensed concepts have semantical priority over untensed concepts, and whether tensed facts have ontological priority over untensed facts.

10. What Gives Time Its Arrow?

Space has no direction, but time does. We see this about space when we notice that a bell can be moved up and down, and left or right. We see this about time when we notice that the bell can be rung but never un-rung, that eggs become omelets but omelets never become eggs, and that a stone will splash into the river and sink but the stone will never rise from the river bed and un-splash. This overall asymmetry in the direction of all the world’s large-scale processes in time is the arrow of time.

The “problem of the arrow of time” is the problem of reconciling the existence of this general arrow of time with the fact that nearly all the basic laws of science in the micro-world do not reveal the arrow. They are time-symmetric. That means the process treats going forward in time no differently than it treats coming backward in time. To understand this, let's do a thought experiment. Suppose you could make a film of a few electrons and protons interacting. If you showed the film in reverse, this would be a film of physically possible activity, according to the micro-physical laws of electrons and protons. That is what it means for the laws of electrons and protons to be time-symmetric. Almost every micro-law is time-symmetric. B meson decay is not time-symmetric, but it seems to be irrelevant to the overall asymmetry of the arrow of time.

Ever since the problem of the direction of time was first described clearly by Josef Loschmidt in 1876 for the kinetic theory of gases, there has been considerable disagreement among the experts on how to solve it.

Let’s begin with the four least popular answers to the problem of time: (a) God wanted the world to have an arrow like this. (b) Everything exists in some possible world or other, and our world just happens to be the one in which things are this way, and that’s the only reason why. (c) It’s just a brute fact with no explanation. (d) It has a correct explanation, but the cognitive power of homo sapiens is too limited to ever figure it out.

The most popular answer to the problem of time’s arrow appeals to the claim that the arrow emerges from entropy increase, which is a numerical measure of the overall change toward disorder in isolated macroscopic systems. This overall change is a change toward equilibrium. That is the change underlying the eggs turning into omelets and bells ringing but never un-ringing. Equilibrium, the goal state, is the state in which the system's energy is uniformly distributed and the system is maximally disordered and at maximum entropy. Everything has run down, so to speak.

Ludwig Boltzmann discovered that entropy evolves toward higher entropy and ultimately to equilibrium because there are more microscopically-indistinguishable ways for energy to be spread out than for it to be more concentrated, so, as particles in a system move around and interact, they will be more likely to adopt configurations in which the energy is more spread out. We make the same point by saying high entropy means there are more ways to arrange a system’s particle constituents to produce a set of fixed values for the macroscopic properties of the system, and low entropy means there are fewer ways. In time, the system shifts toward what is more probable.
This tendency of any isolated system to evolve toward equilibrium is described quantitatively by Boltzmann’s Second Law of Thermodynamics. The law says it is extremely unlikely for the entropy of any isolated, complex system to decrease.

A molecule has no entropy. Entropy is not a property of a single particle, such as a molecule, but only of a macroscopic group of particles such as 1023 of them, which is about Avogadro’s number of them. At the macroscopic level we are “coarse graining” or looking only at higher-level properties of groups of particles such as heat or density or whether the group is an ice cube or a potato.

Not everything has to continually increase its entropy. A child loses entropy as it grows into adulthood, but it does this at the overall expense of entropy loss in a greater system, one that includes the Sun and its radiation toward Earth that provides photosynthesis for plants and indirectly food for the child. Isolate Earth from the Sun’s radiation, and all life will suffer damaging entropy increases.

Ludwig Boltzmann claimed to have derived the Second Law of Thermodynamics from Newton's laws of mechanics. Josef Loschmidt complained in 1876 about the paradoxicality of deducing the practically irreversible Second Law of Thermodynamics from the reversible laws of Newtonian mechanics. This complaint is difficult to answer, and the problem is now called "Loschmidt's Paradox." It is the thermodynamic version of the problem of the direction of time.

The most favored response to the paradox is that Boltzmann's derivation contains a hidden premise. If we were to apply his derivation not from the present to the future, as he did, but rather from the present to the past, then it would imply that entropy was higher in the past. Yet we happen to know entropy was not higher in the past. It was lower. So, Boltzmann failed to notice that his derivation had assumed a hidden premise: that entropy was lower in the past. This lower entropy in turn is due to entropy being even lower in the even more distant past, and so on back.

The Past Hypothesis is the assumption that in the past the state of the system was much lower and could have naturally evolved into its present state in the intervening time. We need to add “in the intervening time” because, if we wait long enough—much longer than the current history of the universe—then anything can evolve into almost anything else; a field full of slaughtered chickens can evolve into a field full of living cows. The development of this idea about waiting long enough requires discussing the Poincaré Recurrence Theorem and its premises.

There is no corresponding future hypothesis, no boundary condition about the future, needed to solve the problem of time’s arrow.

The Past Hypothesis a very special boundary condition about the beginning of the system. If the universe is the system we are interested in, then the Past Hypothesis is a cosmological hypothesis about the entropy at the time of the big bang.

Its philosophical implications are often overlooked. As Sean Carroll explains (Carrroll (2012), Lecture 12), the past hypothesis helps us explain why a photograph or a human memory is a reliable indicator of what happened in the past. Suppose we have a photograph of Donald Trump at his inauguration when he officially became president of the U.S. What is most likely to happen to that photograph in the future? We do not know exactly, but we do know that it very likely will crumble into separate molecules that are scattered throughout the universe. Should we say the same thing about its past, that the photo came from molecules that were scattered throughout the universe and that there was no actual inauguration event intervening? Yes, without the Past Hypothesis.

But with the Past Hypothesis we are justified in saying that the photo was caused by special lower-entropy conditions in the past, and ultimately in this way we can trace out the causal connection between the inauguration event actually happening and the creation of the photo of that event, with entropy decreasing during this interval. Without our knowing the Past Hypothesis is true, the best explanation of the origin of the photo is that it was assembled from separated molecules without an intervening inauguration event. Without the Past Hypothesis, it would be a mistake to infer from the photo that Trump was really inaugurated. This point is often overlooked by epistemologists.

a. Time without an Arrow

If physical changes are all that is required for time to exist, and if the arrow of time is the overall directionality of macroscopic physical processes, and if the existing macroscopic physical changes were to be all random in the sense that any process is no more likely to go one way rather than the reverse, then there could be time without an arrow. There would be no clocks either.

A few philosophers respond to this reasoning by saying time's existence requires, by definition, some sort of arrow and some sort of clock.

Tim Maudlin adds to the discussion:

[T]he temporal structure of the world, independently of its material contents, has an intrinsic directionality. The later states of the world arise from, are produced from, the earlier states. This is independent of, e.g., the direction in which entropy increases. Even if the world were at thermal equilibrium, with constant entropy, still the later states would be produced from the earlier states in accord with the fundamental laws of physics.

His point is that time could exist without an arrow.

b. What Needs to be Explained

There are many goals for a fully developed theory of time’s arrow. It should tell us the answers to this constellation of issues: (1) why time has any direction at all; (2) whether there are two arrows, one having to do with how physical processes evolve, and one having to do with the temporal structure of the world independently of its physical processes; (3) why the arrow points one way rather than the reverse way; (4) why the micro-physical laws of science do not reveal the arrow, (5) how the arrow is connected with entropy, (6) why the arrow goes in the same direction in all galaxies; (7) why it is so probable that the entropy of an isolated system increases in the future rather than decreases even though the decrease is physically possible given current basic laws; (8) what it would be like for our arrow of time to reverse direction; (9) what are the characteristics of a physical theory that would pick out a preferred direction in time; (10) what the relationships are among the various arrows of time; (11) how entropy is connected with quantum entanglement, (12) why the Past Hypothesis is true, (13) whether the Past Hypothesis is needed, and (14) what it is that distinguishes the past from the present and future.

c. Explanations or Theories of the Arrow

Historically, there have been two principal explanations of the arrow of time: (i) it is a product of causation which itself is asymmetrical; (i) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to the initial conditions of our universe.

Leibniz first proposed explanation (i), which is called the causal theory of time's order. Informally, we understand very clearly that causation has a direction. As Craig Callender expressed the point, if I wiggle something now it cannot affect where I was born, but it might affect where I will die. The philosopher Hans Reichenbach developed Leibniz's theory in more detail in 1928. He defined "happens before" by saying that event A happens before event B if A could have caused B, but B could not have caused A. The usefulness of this causal theory depends on clarifying the two notorious notions of causality and possibility without producing a circular explanation that presupposes an understanding of time order. Also, the causal theory should explain why, if we grant that there is causal asymmetry, the asymmetry is in one direction rather than in the inverse direction. Another difficulty for a causal theory of time is that it can succeed only for special relativity but not general relativity. General relativity allows two different spacetimes to have the same relations of causal connectibility among events. A causal theory cannot distinguish the two spacetimes.

21st century physicists generally favor explanation (ii), but there is some disagreement about the Past Hypothesis. Can the Past Hypothesis be justified or explained in more depth? Here are four responses to that question. (1) The initially low entropy is simply a brute fact—that is, there is no causal explanation for it. The physicist Richard Feynman suggested this response. (2) Objecting to inexplicable initial facts as being unacceptably ad hoc, the physicists Walther Ritz and Roger Penrose have said we need to keep looking for some basic, time-asymmetrical laws that will account for the initially low entropy. (3) A third perspective on the Past Hypothesis appeals to God's having designed the big bang to start with low entropy. (4) A fourth perspective appeals to the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics in order to argue that since there have to be so many universes with different initial entropies, there certainly has to be one universe that is like our particular universe with its initially low entropy—and that is the only reason why our universe had low entropy at the beginning of the big bang.

To make one final point about entropy increase, in the early 21st century, M.I.T. professor Seth Lloyd suggested an original explanation for entropy increase: “What’s really going on [with the arrow of time pointing in the direction of equilibrium] is things are becoming more correlated with each other.” His point is that the increasing entropy in any process is really increasing quantum entanglement among the particles in that process. This does not explain, though, why things had less entanglement in the past.

d. Multiple Arrows

Consider the difference between time’s arrow and time’s arrows. The direction of entropy change is the thermodynamic arrow. Here are some suggestions for additional arrows:

  1. Causes precede their effects.
  2. We remember last week, not next week.
  3. It is easier to know the past than to know the future.
  4. There is evidence of the past but not of the future.
  5. Our present actions affect the future and not the past.
  6. Possibilities decrease as time goes on.
  7. Radio waves spread out from the antenna, but never converge into it.
  8. Our universe expands in volume rather than shrinks.
  9. We see black holes but never white holes; objects fall into but never out of black holes.
  10. B meson decay, neutral kaon decay, and Higgs boson decay are each different in a time reversed world.
  11. Quantum mechanical measurement collapses the wave function.
  12. We age and never get biologically younger.

Most physicists suspect all these arrows are linked so that we cannot have some arrows reversing while others do not. The thermodynamic arrow, the arrow of entropy increase is the leading candidate for a unified explanation of all the arrows.

However, some physicists say the details of the linkage of the arrows is still an open question, and it is not yet clear whether or how the thermodynamic arrow underlies all other arrows.

e. Reversing the Arrow

Could the cosmic arrow of time have gone the other way? Most physicists agree that the answer is yes, and they say it would have gone the other way if the initial conditions of our universe at our big bang event had been very different. There could be initial conditions that make bells un-ring and people rise from their graves.

In 1902 in Appearance and Reality, the British idealist philosopher F. H. Bradley said that when time runs backwards compared to our current world, "Death would come before birth, the blow would follow the wound, and all must seem irrational." The Australian philosopher J. J. C. Smart disagreed about the irrationality. He said all would seem as it is now because memory would become precognition, so an inhabitant of a time-reversed world would feel the blow and then the wound.

G. J. Whitrow in The Natural Philosophy of Time, defended Bradley and argued that memory would not become precognition; his justification was that memory, by definition, is of whatever happens first, so, "all must seem irrational."

11. What is Temporal Logic?

Temporal logic is the representation of reasoning about time by using the methods of symbolic logic in order to formalize which statements about time imply which others. For example, in McTaggart's B-series, the most important relation is the happens-before relation on events. Logicians have asked what sort of principles must this relation obey in order to properly account for our reasoning about time.

Here is one suggestion. Consider this informally valid reasoning:

Adam's arrival at the train station happens before Bryan's. Therefore, Bryan's arrival at the station does not happen before Adam's.

Let us translate this into classical predicate logic using a domain of instantaneous events, where the individual constant 'a' denotes Adam's arrival at the train station, and 'b' denotes Bryan's arrival at the train station. Let the two-argument relation Bxy be interpreted as "x happens before y." The direct translation of the informal argument produces:


(The symbol '~' is the negation operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol '¬' for negation.) Unfortunately, this simple formal argument is invalid. To make the argument become valid, we should add the implicit premise that the B relation is asymmetric. That is, we need to add this additional premise to the argument:

∀x∀y[Bxy ~Byx]

We might want to add this principle as an axiom into our temporal logic. (The symbol '' is the conditional operator or if-then operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol '⊃' instead.)

In other informally valid reasoning, we discover a need to make even more assumptions about the happens-before relation. For example, suppose Adam arrives at the train station before Bryan, and suppose Bryan arrives before Charles. Is it valid reasoning to infer that Adam arrives before Charles? Yes, but if we translate directly into classical predicate logic we get this invalid argument:


To make this argument be valid we need the implicit premise that says the happens-before relation is transitive, that is:

∀x∀y∀z [(Bxy & Byz) Bxz]

The symbol '∀x' is the universal quantifier on x. The symbol '&' is the conjunction operator. Some logicians prefer to use '(x)' for the universal quantifier and either '∧' or '' for conjunction.

What other constraints should be placed on the B relation (when it is to be interpreted as the happens-before relation)? Here are some of the many suggestions: (1) ∀x~Bxx. An event cannot happen before itself. (2) In any reference frame any two events are related somehow by the B relation. There are no temporally unrelated pairs of events. (3) B is dense in the sense that there is a third point event between any two point events that are not simultaneous. This prevents quantized time. (4) ∀x∀y(Bxy ~Byx). An event cannot happen both before and after some event. (5) ∀x∃yBxy. Time is infinite in the future.

The more classical approach to temporal logic, however, does not add premises to arguments in classical predicate logic as we have just been doing. The classical approach is via tense logic, a formalism that adds tense operators on propositions of propositional logic or predicate logic. The pioneer in the late 1950s was A. N. Prior. He created a new symbolic logic to describe our reasoning involving time phrases such as “now,” “happens before,” “twenty-three minutes afterwards,” “at all times,” and “sometimes.” He hoped that a precise, formal treatment of these concepts could lead to resolution of some of the controversial philosophical issues about time.

Prior begins with an important assumption: that a proposition such as “Custer dies in Montana” can be true at one time and false at another time. That assumption is challenged by some philosophers, such as W.V. Quine, who prefer to avoid use of this sort of proposition and who recommend that temporal logics use only sentences that are timelessly true or timelessly false, and that have no indexicals whose reference can shift from one context to another.

Prior's main original idea was to appreciate that time concepts are similar in structure to modal concepts such as “it is possible that” and “it is necessary that.” He adapted modal propositional logic for his tense logic. Michael Dummett and E. J. Lemmon also made major, early contributions to tense logic. One standard system of tense logic is a variant of the S4.3 system of modal logic. In this formal tense logic, the modal operator that is interpreted to mean “it is possible that” is re-interpreted to mean “at some past time it was the case that” or, equivalently, “it once was the case that,” or "it once was that." Let the capital letter 'P' represent this operator. P will operate on present-tensed propositions, such as p. If p represents the proposition “Custer dies in Montana,” then Pp says Custer died in Montana. If Prior can make do with the variable p ranging only over present-tensed propositions, then he may have found a way to eliminate any ontological commitment to non-present entities such as dinosaurs while preserving the possibility of true past tense propositions such as "There were dinosaurs."

Prior added to the axioms of classical propositional logic the axiom P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq). The axiom says that for any two propositions p and q, at some past time it was the case that p or q if and only if either at some past time it was the case that p or at some past time (perhaps a different past time) it was the case that q.

If p is the proposition “Custer dies in Montana” and q is “Sitting Bull dies in Montana,” then

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq)


Custer or Sitting Bull died in Montana if and only if either Custer died in Montana or Sitting Bull died in Montana.

The S4.3 system’s key axiom is the equivalence, for all propositions p and q,

(Pp & Pq) ↔ [P(p & q) v P(p & Pq) v P(q & Pp)].

This axiom when interpreted in tense logic captures part of our ordinary conception of time as a linear succession of states of the world.

Another axiom of tense logic might state that if proposition q is true, then it will always be true that q has been true at some time. If H is the operator “It has always been the case that,” then a new axiom might be

Pp ↔ ~H~p.

This axiom of tense logic is analogous to the modal logic axiom that p is possible if and only if it is not the case that it is necessary that not-p.

A tense logic may need additional axioms in order to express “q has been true for the past two weeks.” Prior and others have suggested a wide variety of additional axioms for tense logic, but logicians still disagree about which axioms to accept.

It is controversial whether to add axioms that express the topology of time, for example that it comes to an end or doesn't come to an end; the reason usually given is that this is an empirical matter, not a matter for logic to settle.

Regarding a semantics for tense logic, Prior had the idea that the truth of a tensed proposition should be expressed in terms of truth-at-a-time. For example, a modal proposition Pp (it was once the case that p) is true at-a-time t if and only if p is true-at-a-time earlier than t. This suggestion has led to an extensive development of the formal semantics for tense logic.

The concept of being in the past is usually treated by metaphysicians as a predicate that assigns properties to events, but, in the tense logic just presented, the concept is treated as an operator P upon propositions, and this difference in treatment is objectionable to some metaphysicians.

The other major approach to temporal logic does not use a tense logic. Instead, it formalizes temporal reasoning within a first-order logic without modal-like tense operators. One method for developing ideas about temporal logic is the method of temporal arguments which adds an additional temporal argument to any predicate involving time in order to indicate how its satisfaction depends on time. A predicate such as “is less than seven” does not involve time, but the predicate “is resting” does, even though both use the word "is". If the “x is resting” is represented classically as P(x), where P is a one-argument predicate, then it could be represented in temporal logic instead as the two-argument predicate P(x,t), and this would be interpreted as saying x has property P at time t. P has been changed to a two-argument predicate by adding a “temporal argument.” The time variable 't' is treated as a new sort of variable requiring new axioms. Suggested new axioms allow time to be a dense linear ordering of instantaneous instants or to be continuous or to have some other structure.

Occasionally the method of temporal arguments uses a special constant symbol, say 'n', to denote now, the present time. This helps with the translation of common temporal sentences. For example, let Q(t) be interpreted as “Socrates is sitting down at t.” The sentence or proposition that Socrates has always been sitting down may be expressed in first-order temporal logic as

(∀t)[(t < n) → Q(t)].

Some temporal logics allow sentences to lack both classical truth-values. The first person to give a clear presentation of the implications of treating declarative sentences as being neither true nor false was the Polish logician Jan Lukasiewicz in 1920. To carry out Aristotle’s suggestion that future contingent sentences do not yet have truth values, he developed a three-valued symbolic logic, with each grammatical declarative sentence having the truth-values True, or False, or else Indeterminate [T, F, or I]. Contingent sentences about the future, such as, "There will be a sea battle tomorrow," are assigned an I value in order to indicate the indeterminacy of the future. Truth tables for the connectives of propositional logic are redefined to maintain logical consistency and to maximally preserve our intuitions about truth and falsehood. See (Haack 1974) for more details about this application of three-valued logic.

Different temporal logics have been created depending on whether one wants to model circular time, discrete time, time obeying general relativity, the time of ordinary discourse, and so forth. There is considerable interest in how to account for reasoning that presumes the existence of an open future, perhaps in a non-deterministic universe that branches from the present into many possible futures. For an introduction to tense logic and other temporal logics, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).

12. Supplements

a. Frequently Asked Questions

The following questions are addressed in the Time Supplement article:

  1. What are Instants and Durations?
  2. What is an Event?
  3. What is a Reference Frame?
  4. What is an Inertial Frame?
  5. What is Spacetime?
  6. What is a Minkowski Diagram?
  7. What are the Metric and the Interval?
  8. Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time is Part of Space?
  9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
  10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
  11. How is Time Relative to the Observer?
  12. What is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
  13. What is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
  14. What is the Difference Between the Past and the Absolute Past?
  15. What is Time Dilation?
  16. How does Gravity Affect Time?
  17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
  18. What is the Solution to the Twin Paradox (the Clock Paradox)?
  19. What is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
  20. How do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
  21. How do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
  22. What is Essential to Being a Clock?
  23. What does It Mean for a Clock To Be Accurate?
  24. What is Our Standard Clock?
  25. Why are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?
  26. What is a Field?

b. What Else Science Requires of Time

What Else Science Requires of Time

c. Special Relativity: Proper times, Coordinate systems, and Lorentz Transformations

Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)

13. References and Further Reading

  • Barbour, Julian. The End of Time, Weidenfeld and Nicolson, London, and Oxford University Press, New York, 1999.
    • A popular presentation of Barbour's theory that if we could see the universe as it is, we should see that it is static. It is static, he says, because his way of quantizing general relativity, namely quantum geometrodynamics with its Wheeler-DeWitt equation, implies a time-independent quantum state for the universe as a whole. He then offers an exotic explanation of why time seems to exist.
  • Butterfield, Jeremy. “Seeing the Present” Mind, 93, (1984), pp. 161-76.
    • Defends the B-camp position on the subjectivity of the present; and argues against a global present.
  • Callender, Craig, and Ralph Edney. Introducing Time, Totem Books, USA, 2001.
    • A cartoon-style book covering most of the topics in this encyclopedia article in a more elementary way. Each page is two-thirds graphics and one-third text.
  • Callender, Craig and Carl Hoefer. “Philosophy of Space-Time Physics” in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, ed. by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, 2002, pp. 173-98.
    • Discusses whether it is a fact or a convention that in a reference frame the speed of light going one direction is the same as the speed coming back.
  • Callender, Craig. "The Subjectivity of the Present," Chronos, V, 2003-4, pp. 108-126.
    • Surveys the psychological and neuroscience literature and suggests that the evidence tends to support the claim that our experience of the "now" is the experience of a subjective property rather than merely of an objective property, and it offers an interesting explanation of why so many people believe in the objectivity of the present.
  • Callender, Craig. " The Common Now," Philosophical Issues 18, pp. 339-361 (2008).
    • Develops the ideas presented in (Callender 2003-4).
  • Callender, Craig. "Is Time an Illusion?", Scientific American, June, 2010, pp. 58-65.
    • Explains how the belief that time is fundamental may be an illusion.
  • Carroll, John W. and Ned Markosian. An Introduction to Metaphysics. Cambridge University Press, 2010.
    • This introductory, undergraduate metaphysics textbook contains an excellent chapter introducing the metaphysical issues involving time, beginning with the McTaggart controversy.
  • Carroll, Sean. From Eternity to Here: The Quest for the Ultimate Theory of Time, Dutton/Penguin Group, New York, 2010.
    • Part Three "Entropy and Time's Arrow" provides a very clear explanation of the details of the problems involved with time's arrow. For an interesting answer to the question of whether any interaction between our part of the universe and a part in which the arrow of times goes in reverse, see endnote 137 for p. 164.
  • Carroll, Sean. "Ten Things Everyone Should Know About Time," Discover Magazine, Cosmic Variance, online 2011.
    • Contains the quotation about how the mind reconstructs its story of what is happening "now."
  • Carroll, Sean. Mysteries of Modern Physics: Time. The Teaching Company, The Great Courses: Chantilly, Virginia 2012.
    • A series of popular lectures about time by a renowned physicist with an interest in philosophical issues, but emphasizing the arrow of time.
  • Damasio, Antonio R. “Remembering When,” Scientific American: Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 287, no. 3, 2002; reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp.34-41.
    • A look at the brain structures involved in how our mind organizes our experiences into the proper temporal order. Includes a discussion of Benjamin Libet’s discovery in the 1970s that the brain events involved in initiating a free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our making the choice.
  • Dainton, Barry. Time and Space, Second Edition, McGill-Queens University Press: Ithaca, 2010.
    • An easy-to-read, but technically correct, book. This is probably the best single book to read for someone desiring to understand in more depth the issues presented in this encyclopedia article.
  • Davies, Paul. About Time: Einstein’s Unfinished Revolution, Simon & Schuster, 1995.
    • An easy to read survey of the impact of the theory of relativity on our understanding of time.
  • Davies, Paul. How to Build a Time Machine, Viking Penguin, 2002.
    • A popular exposition of the details behind the possibilities of time travel.
  • Deutsch, David and Michael Lockwood, “The Quantum Physics of Time Travel,” Scientific American, pp. 68-74. March 1994.
    • An investigation of the puzzle of getting information for free by traveling in time.
  • Dowden, Bradley. The Metaphysics of Time: A Dialogue, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc. 2009.
    • An undergraduate textbook in dialogue form that covers most of the topics discussed in this encyclopedia article.
  • Dummett, Michael. “Is Time a Continuum of Instants?,” Philosophy, 2000, Cambridge University Press, pp. 497-515.
    • A constructivist model of time that challenges the idea that time is composed of durationless instants.
  • Earman, John. “Implications of Causal Propagation Outside the Null-Cone," Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, 1972, pp. 222-37.
    • Describes his rocket paradox that challenges time travel to the past.
  • Fisher, A. R. J. “David Lewis, Donald C. Williams, and the History of Metaphysics in the Twentieth Century.” Journal of the American Philosophical Association, volume 1, issue 1, Spring 2015.
    • Discusses the disagreements between Lewis and Williams, who both are four-dimensionalists, about the nature of time travel.
  • Grant, Andrew. "Time's Arrow," Science News, July 25, 2015, pp. 15-18.
    • Popular description of why our early universe was so orderly even though nature should always have preferred the disorderly.
  • Greene, Brian. The Hidden Reality: Parallel Universes and the Deep Laws of the Universe, Vintage Books, New York. 2011.
    • Describes nine versions of the Multiverse Theory, including the Ultimate multiverse theory described by the philosopher Robert Nozick.
  • Grünbaum, Adolf. “Relativity and the Atomicity of Becoming,” Review of Metaphysics, 1950-51, pp. 143-186.
    • An attack on the notion of time’s flow, and a defense of the treatment of time and space as being continua and of physical processes as being aggregates of point-events. Difficult reading.
  • Haack, Susan. Deviant Logic, Cambridge University Press, 1974.
    • Chapter 4 contains a clear account of Aristotle’s argument (in section 9c of the present article) for truth value gaps, and its development in Lukasiewicz’s three-valued logic.
  • Hawking, Stephen. “The Chronology Protection Hypothesis,” Physical Review. D 46, p. 603, 1992.
    • Reasons for the impossibility of time travel.
  • Hawking, Stephen. A Brief History of Time, Updated and Expanded Tenth Anniversary Edition, Bantam Books, 1996.
    • A leading theoretical physicist provides introductory chapters on space and time, black holes, the origin and fate of the universe, the arrow of time, and time travel. Hawking suggests that perhaps our universe originally had four space dimensions and no time dimension, and time came into existence when one of the space dimensions evolved into a time dimension. He calls this space dimension “imaginary time.”
  • Horwich, Paul. Asymmetries in Time, The MIT Press, 1987.
    • A monograph that relates the central problems of time to other problems in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of action.
  • Katzenstein, Larry, ed. Scientific American Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 16, no. 1, 2006.
    • A collection of Scientific American articles about time.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. and Glenn D. Starkman, “The Fate of Life in the Universe,” Scientific American Special Edition: The Once and Future Cosmos, Dec. 2002, pp. 50-57.
    • Discusses the future of intelligent life and how it might adapt to and survive the expansion of the universe.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. A Universe from Nothing. Atria Paperback, New York, 2012.
    • Discusses on p. 170 why we live in a universe with time rather than with no time. The issue is pursued further in the afterward to the paperback edition that is not included within the hardback edition. Krauss' position on why there is something rather than nothing was challenged by the philosopher David Albert in his March 23, 2012 review of Krauss' hardback book in The New York Times newspaper.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, “Omniscience and Immutability,” The Journal of Philosophy, July 1966, pp. 409-421.
    • If God knows what time it is, does this demonstrate that God is not immutable?
  • Lasky, Ronald C. “Time and the Twin Paradox,” in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 21-23.
    • A short, but careful and authoritative analysis of the twin paradox, with helpful graphs showing how each twin would view his clock and the other twin’s clock during the trip. Because of the spaceship’s changing velocity by turning around, the twin on the spaceship has a shorter world-line than the Earth-based twin and takes less time than the Earth-based twin.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin and Murray MacBeath, The Philosophy of Time, Oxford University Press, 1993.
    • A collection of twelve influential articles on the passage of time, subjective facts, the reality of the future, the unreality of time, time without change, causal theories of time, time travel, causation, empty time, topology, possible worlds, tense and modality, direction and possibility, and thought experiments about time. Difficult reading for undergraduates.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin, Travels in Four Dimensions: The Enigmas of Space and Time, Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • A philosophical introduction to conceptual questions involving space and time. Suitable for use as an undergraduate textbook without presupposing any other course in philosophy. There is a de-emphasis on teaching the scientific theories, and an emphasis on elementary introductions to the relationship of time to change, the implications that different structures for time have for our understanding of causation, difficulties with Zeno’s Paradoxes, whether time passes, the nature of the present, and why time has an arrow. The treatment of time travel says, rather oddly, that time machines “disappear” and that when a “time machine leaves for 2101, it simply does not exist in the intervening times,” as measured from an external reference frame.
  • Lewis, David. "The Paradoxes of Time Travel." American Philosophical Quarterly, 13:145-52, 1976.
    • A classic argument against changing the past. Lewis assumes the B-theory of time.
  • Lockwood, Michael, The Labyrinth of Time: Introducing the Universe, Oxford University Press, 2005.
    • A philosopher of physics presents the implications of contemporary physics for our understanding of time. Chapter 15, “Schrödinger’s Time-Traveller,” presents the Oxford physicist David Deutsch’s quantum analysis of time travel.
  • Markosian, Ned, “A Defense of Presentism,” in Zimmerman, Dean (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 1, Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Maudlin, Tim. The Metaphysics Within Physics, Oxford University Press, 2007.
    • Chapter 4, “On the Passing of Time,” defends the dynamic theory of time’s flow, and argues that the passage of time is objective.
  • McTaggart, J. M. E. The Nature of Existence, Cambridge University Press, 1927.
    • Chapter 33 restates more clearly the arguments that McTaggart presented in 1908 for his A series and B series and how they should be understood to show that time is unreal. Difficult reading. The argument that a single event is in the past, is present, and will be future yet it is inconsistent for an event to have more than one of these properties is called "McTaggart's Paradox." The chapter is renamed "The Unreality of Time," and is reprinted on pp. 23-59 of (LePoidevin and MacBeath 1993).
  • Mellor, D. H. Real Time II, International Library of Philosophy, 1998.
    • This monograph presents a subjective theory of tenses. Mellor argues that the truth conditions of any tensed sentence can be explained without tensed facts.
  • Mozersky, M. Joshua. "The B-Theory in the Twentieth Century," in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., 2013, pp. 167-182.
    • A detailed evaluation and defense of the B-Theory.
  • Nadis, Steve. "Starting Point," Discover, September 2013, pp. 36-41.
    • Non-technical discussion of the argument by cosmologist Alexander Vilenkin that the past of the multiverse must be finite (there was a first bubble) but its future must be infinite (always more bubbles).
  • Norton, John. "Time Really Passes," Humana.Mente: Journal of Philosophical Studies, 13 April 2010.
    • Argues that "We don't find passage in our present theories and we would like to preserve the vanity that our physical theories of time have captured all the important facts of time. So we protect our vanity by the stratagem of dismissing passage as an illusion."
  • Øhrstrøm, P. and P. F. V. Hasle. Temporal Logic: from Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence. Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1995.
    • An elementary introduction to the logic of temporal reasoning.
  • Perry, John. "The Problem of the Essential Indexical," Noûs, 13(1), (1979), pp. 3-21.
    • Argues that indexicals are essential to what we want to say in natural language; they cannot be eliminated in favor of B-theory discourse.
  • Pinker, Steven. The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature, Penguin Group, 2007.
    • Chapter 4 discusses how the conceptions of space and time are expressed in language in a way very different from that described by either Kant or Newton. Page 189 says that t in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. Chinese has no tenses.
  • Pöppel, Ernst. Mindworks: Time and Conscious Experience. San Diego: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich. 1988.
    • A neuroscientist explores our experience of time.
  • Prior, A. N. “Thank Goodness That’s Over,” Philosophy, 34 (1959), p. 17.
    • Argues that a tenseless or B-theory of time fails to account for our relief that painful past events are in the past rather than in the present.
  • Prior, A. N. Past, Present and Future, Oxford University Press, 1967.
    • A pioneering work in temporal logic, the symbolic logic of time, which permits propositions to be true at one time and false at another.
  • Prior, A. N. “Critical Notices: Richard Gale, The Language of Time,” Mind, 78, no. 311, 1969, 453-460.
    • Contains his attack on the attempt to define time in terms of causation.
  • Prior, A. N. “The Notion of the Present,” Studium Generale, volume 23, 1970, pp. 245-8.
    • A brief defense of presentism, the view that the past and the future are not real.
  • Putnam, Hilary. "Time and Physical Geometry," The Journal of Philosophy, 64 (1967), pp. 240-246.
    • Comments on whether Aristotle is a presentist and why Aristotle was wrong if Relativity is right.
  • Russell, Bertrand. "On the Experience of Time," Monist, 25 (1915), pp. 212-233.
    • The classical tenseless theory.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. Reality is Not What It Seems: The Journey to Quantum Gravity. Riverhead Books, New York, 2017.
    • A look at time in the theory of loop quantum gravity.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Our Knowledge of the External World. W. W. Norton and Co., New York, 1929, pp. 123-128.
    • Russell develops his formal theory of time that presupposes the relational theory of time.
  • Saunders, Simon. "How Relativity Contradicts Presentism," in Time, Reality & Experience edited by Craig Callender, Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 277-292.
    • Reviews the arguments for and against the claim that, since the present in the theory of relativity is relative to reference frame, presentism must be incorrect.
  • Savitt, Steven F. (ed.). Time’s Arrows Today: Recent Physical and Philosophical Work on the Direction of Time. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • A survey of research in this area, presupposing sophisticated knowledge of mathematics and physics.
  • Sciama, Dennis. “Time ‘Paradoxes’ in Relativity,” in The Nature of Time edited by Raymond Flood and Michael Lockwood, Basil Blackwell, 1986, pp. 6-21.
    • A good account of the twin paradox.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. “Time without Change,” Journal of Philosophy, 66 (1969), pp. 363-381.
    • A thought experiment designed to show us circumstances in which the existence of changeless periods in the universe could be detected.
  • Sider, Ted. “The Stage View and Temporary Intrinsics,” The Philosophical Review, 106 (2) (2000), pp. 197-231.
    • Examines the problem of temporary intrinsics and the pros and cons of four-dimensionalism.
  • Sklar, Lawrence. Space, Time, and Spacetime, University of California Press, 1976.
    • Chapter III, Section E discusses general relativity and the problem of substantival spacetime, where Sklar argues that Einstein’s theory does not support Mach’s views against Newton’s interpretations of his bucket experiment; that is, Mach’s argument against substantivialism fails.
  • Sorabji, Richard. Matter, Space, & Motion: Theories in Antiquity and Their Sequel. Cornell University Press, 1988.
    • Chapter 10 discusses ancient and contemporary accounts of circular time.
  • Steinhardt, Paul J. "The Inflation Debate: Is the theory at the heart of modern cosmology deeply flawed?" Scientific American, April, 2011, pp. 36-43.
    • Argues that the big bang Theory with inflation is incorrect and that we need a cyclic cosmology with an eternal series of big bangs and big crunches but with no inflation.
  • Thomson, Judith Jarvis. "Parthood and Identity across Time," Journal of Philosophy 80, 1983, 201-20.
    • Argues against four-dimensionalism and its idea of objects having infinitely many temporal parts.
  • Thorne, Kip S. Black Holes and Time Warps: Einstein’s Outrageous Legacy, W. W. Norton & Co., 1994.
    • Chapter 14 is a popular account of how to use a wormhole to create a time machine.
  • Van Fraassen, Bas C. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Time and Space, Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An advanced undergraduate textbook by an important philosopher of science.
  • Veneziano, Gabriele. “The Myth of the Beginning of Time,” Scientific American, May 2004, pp. 54-65, reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 72-81.
    • An account of string theory’s impact on our understanding of time’s origin. Veneziano hypothesizes that our big bang was not the origin of time but simply the outcome of a preexisting state.
  • Whitrow. G. J. The Natural Philosophy of Time, Second Edition, Clarendon Press, 1980.
    • A broad survey of the topic of time and its role in physics, biology, and psychology. Pitched at a higher level than the Davies books.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.


If we were pressed to give a definition of emergence, we could say that a property is emergent if it is a novel property of a system or an entity that arises when that system or entity has reached a certain level of complexity and that, even though it exists only insofar as the system or entity exists, it is distinct from the properties of the parts of the system from which it emerges. However, as will become apparent, things are not so simple because “emergence” is a term used in different ways both in science and in philosophy, and how it is to be defined is a substantive question in itself.

The term “emergence” comes from the Latin verb emergo which means to arise, to rise up, to come up or to come forth. The term was coined by G. H. Lewes in Problems of Life and Mind (1875) who drew the distinction between emergent and resultant effects.

Effects are resultant if they can be calculated by the mere addition or subtraction of causes operating together, as with the weight of an object, when one can calculate its weight merely by adding the weights of the parts that make it up. Effects are emergent if they cannot be thus calculated, because they are qualitatively novel compared to the causes from which they emerge. For Lewes, examples of such emergent effects are mental properties that emerge from neural processes yet are not properties of the parts of the neural processes from which they emerge.  In Lewes’ work, three essential features of emergence are laid out. First, that emergentism is a theory about the structure of the natural world; and, consequently, it has ramifications concerning the unity of science. Second, that emergence is a relation between properties of an entity and the properties of its parts. Third, that the question of emergence is related to the question of the possibility of reduction. These three features will structure this article's discussion of emergence.

Table of Contents

  1. The British Emergentists
    1. J. S. Mill
    2. Samuel Alexander
    3. C. Lloyd Morgan
    4. C. D. Broad
  2. Later Emergentism
    1. Kinds of Emergence
      1. Strong and Weak Emergence
        1. Strong Emergence: Novelty as Irreducibility and Downward Causation
        2. Weak Emergence: Novelty as Unpredictability
      2. Synchronic and Diachronic Emergence
    2. Emergence and Supervenience
  3. Objections to Emergentism
    1. The Supervenience Argument
    2. Do Cases of Genuine (Strong) Emergence Exist?
  4. References and Further Reading

1. The British Emergentists

The group of emergentists that Brian McLaughlin (1992) has dubbed the “British emergentists” were the first to make emergence the core of a comprehensive philosophical position in the second half of the nineteenth century and the beginning of the twentieth century. A central question at that time was whether life, mind and chemical bonding could be given a physical explanation and, by extension, whether special sciences such as psychology and biology were reducible to more “basic”’ sciences and, eventually, to physics. Views were divided between the reductionist mechanists and the anti-reductionist vitalists. The mechanists claimed that the properties of an organism are resultant properties that can be fully explained, actually or in principle, in terms of the properties and relations of its parts. The vitalists claimed that organic matter differs fundamentally from inorganic matter and that what accounts for the properties of living organisms is not the arrangement of their constitutive physical and chemical parts, but some sort of entelechy or spirit. In this debate the emergentists proposed a middle way in which, against the mechanists, the whole is more than just the sum and arrangement of its parts yet, against the vitalists, without anything being added to it “from the outside”—that is, there is no need to posit any mysterious intervening entelechy to explain irreducible emergent properties.

Though the views of the British emergentists differ in their details we can generally say they were monists regarding objects or substances in as much as the world is made of fundamentally one kind of thing, matter. However, they also held that at different levels of organization and complexity matter exhibits different properties that are novel relative to the lower levels of organization from which they emerged and this makes the emergentist view one of property dualism (or pluralism). It should also be noted that the British emergentists identified their view as a naturalist position firstly because whether something is emergent or not is to be established or rejected by empirical evidence alone, and secondly because no extra-natural powers, entelechies, souls and so forth are used in emergentist explanations. The main texts of this tradition of the so-called “British emergentists” are J. S. Mill’s System of Logic, Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, C. Lloyd Morgan’s Emergent Evolution and C. D. Broad’s The Mind and its Place in Nature. Beyond these emergentists, traditional brands of emergentism can be found in the work of R. W. Sellars (1922), A. Lovejoy (1927), Roger Sperry (1980, 1991), Karl Popper and John Eccles (1977) and Michael Polanyi (1968).

a. J. S. Mill

Though he did not use the term ‘emergence,’ it was Mill’s System of Logic (1843) that marked the beginning of British emergentism.

Mill distinguished between two modes of what he called “the conjoint action of causes,” the mechanical and the chemical. In the mechanical mode the effect of a group of causes is nothing more than the sum of the effects that each individual cause would have were it acting alone. Mill calls the principle according to which the whole effect is the sum of the effects of its parts the “principle of composition of causes” and illustrates it by reference to the vector sum of forces. The effects thus produced in the mechanical mode are called “homopathic effects” and they are subject to causal “homopathic laws.” Mill contrasts the mechanical mode with the chemical mode in which the principle of composition of causes does not hold. In the chemical mode causal effects are not additive but, instead, they are “heteropathic” which means that the conjoint effect of different causes is different from the sum the effects the causes would have in isolation. The paradigmatic examples of such effects were, for Mill, the products of chemical reactions which have different properties and effects than those of the individual reactants. Take, for example a typical substitution reaction:

Zn + 2HCl → ZnCl2 + H2.

In such a reaction zinc reacts with hydrogen chloride and replaces the hydrogen in the latter to produce effects that are more than just the sum of the parts that came together at the beginning of the reaction. The newly formed zinc chloride has properties that neither zinc nor hydrogen chloride possess separately.

Mill’s heteropathic effects are the equivalent of Lewes’ emergent effects, whereas homopathic effects are the equivalent of Lewes’ resultants. Heteropathic effects are subject, according to Mill, to causal “heteropathic” laws which, though now relative to the laws of the levels from which they emerged, do not counteract them. Such laws are found in the special sciences such as chemistry, biology and psychology.

b. Samuel Alexander

In Space, Time and Deity (1920), Samuel Alexander built a complex metaphysical system that has been subject to a number of different interpretations. As we shall see, Alexander in effect talks of different levels of explanation as opposed to the more robust ontological emergence we find in the works of the other British emergentists.

According to Alexander, all processes are physico-chemical processes but as their complexity increases they give rise to emergent qualities that are distinctive of the new complex configurations. These are subject to special laws that are treated by autonomous special sciences that give higher-order explanations of the behavior of complex configurations. One kind of such emergent qualities is mental qualities (others are biological and chemical qualities). Since for Alexander all processes are physico-chemical processes, mental processes are identical to neural processes. However Alexander claims that mental qualities are distinctive of higher-order configurations. Furthermore, Alexander claims, mental qualities are not epiphenomenal. A neural process that lost its mental qualities would not be the same process because it is in virtue of its mental qualities that the “nervous”—neural—process has the character and effects that it has. So though emergent qualities are co-instantiated in one instance in a physico-chemical process, they are distinct from that process due to their novel causal powers.

Alexander also holds that emergent qualities and their behavior cannot be deduced even by a Laplacean calculator from knowledge of the qualities and laws of the lower—physiological—order. To be precise, though a Laplacean calculator could predict all physical processes (and hence all mental processes, since mental processes are physical processes) he would not be able to predict the emergent qualities of those events because their configuration, though being in its entirety physico-chemical, exhibits different behavior from the kind the physico-chemical sciences are concerned with and this behavior is, in turn, captured by emergent laws. Hence the emergence of such qualities should be taken as a brute empirical fact that can be given no explanation and should be accepted with “natural piety”. However it should be noted here that Alexander leaves open the possibility that, if chemical properties were to be reduced without residue to physico-chemical processes, then they would not be emergent, and he adds that the same holds for mental properties.

c. C. Lloyd Morgan

In Emergent Evolution (1923) (and subsequently in Life, Spirit and Mind [1926] and The Emergence of Novelty [1933]) the biologist C. Lloyd Morgan introduced the notion of emergence into the notion of the process of evolution and maintained that in the course of evolution new properties and behaviors emerge (like life, mind and reflective thought) that cannot be predicted from the already existing entities they emerged from. Taking off from Mill and Lewes, Morgan cites as the paradigmatic case of an emergent phenomenon the products of chemical reactions that are novel and unpredictable. These novel properties, moreover, are not merely epiphenomenal but bring about “a new kind of relatedness”—new lawful connections—that affects the “manner of go” of lower-level events in a way that would not occur had they been absent. Thus emergent properties are causally autonomous and have downward causal powers.

d. C. D. Broad

The last major work in the British emergentist tradition and, arguably, the historical foundation of contemporary discussions of emergence in philosophy, was C. D. Broad’s Mind and Its Place in Nature (1925).

Broad identified three possible answers to the question of how the properties of a complex system are related to the properties of its parts. The “component theory” of the vitalists, the reductive answer of the mechanists and the emergentist view that the behavior of the whole cannot in principle be deduced from knowledge of the parts and their arrangement.  From this latter view—Broad's own—it follows that contrary to the mechanist’s view of the world as homogeneous throughout, reality is structured in aggregates of different order. Different orders in this sense exhibit different organizational complexity and the kinds that make up each order are made up of the kinds to be found in lower orders. This lack of unity is, in turn, reflected in the sciences, where there is a hierarchy with physics at the lower order and then ascending chemistry, biology and psychology—the subject matter of each being properties of different orders that are irreducible to properties of the lower orders. According to Broad these different orders are subject to different kinds of laws: trans-ordinal laws that connect properties of adjacent orders and intra-ordinal laws that hold between properties within the same order. Trans-ordinal laws, Broad writes, cannot be deduced from intra-ordinal laws and principles that connect the vocabularies of the two orders between which they hold; trans-ordinal laws are irreducible to intra-ordinal laws and, as such, are fundamental emergent laws—they are metaphysical brute facts.

Broad considered the question whether a trans-ordinal law is emergent to be an empirical question. Though he considered the behavior of all chemical compounds irreducible and thus emergent, he admitted, like Alexander, that if one day it is reduced to the physical characteristics of the chemical compound’s components it will not then count as emergent. However, unlike Alexander, he did not consider the same possible concerning the phenomenal experiences that “pure”—secondary—qualities of objects cause in us. Broad calls trans-ordinal laws that hold between physical properties and secondary qualities “trans-physical laws”. Though he is willing to grant that it could turn out that we mistakenly consider some trans-ordinal laws to be emergent purely on the basis of our incomplete knowledge, trans-physical laws are necessarily emergent—we could never have formed the concept of blue, no matter how much knowledge we had of colors, unless we had experienced it.  Broad puts forward an a priori argument to this effect that can be seen as a precursor of the knowledge argument against physicalism. These qualities, he says, could not have been predicted even by a “mathematical archangel” who knows everything there is to know about the structure and working of the physical world and can perform any mathematical calculation—they are in principle irreducible, only inductively predictable and hence emergent.

In this we see that Broad’s emergentism concerning the phenomenal experience of secondary qualities is not epistemological (as is sometimes suggested by his writings) but is a consequence of an ontological distinction of properties. That is, the impossibility of prediction which he cites as a criterion of emergence is a consequence of the metaphysical structure of the world; the “mathematical archangel” could not have predicted emergent properties not because of complexity or because of limits to what can be expressed by lower-level concepts, but because emergent facts and laws are brute facts or else are laws that are in principle not reductively explainable.

2. Later Emergentism

Beginning in the late 1920’s, advances in science such as the explanation of chemical bonding by quantum mechanics and the development of molecular biology put an end to claims of emergence in chemistry and biology and thus marked the beginning of the fall of the emergentist heyday and the beginning of an era of reductionist enthusiasm. However, beginning with Putnam’s arguments for multiple realizability in the 1960’s, Davidson’s anomalous monism of the psychophysical and Fodor’s argument for the autonomy of the special sciences, the identity theory  and reductionism were dealt a severe blow. Today, within a predominant anti-reductivist monist climate, emergentism has reappeared in complex systems theory, cognitive science and the philosophy of mind.

a. Kinds of Emergence

Because emergent properties are novel properties, there are different conceptions of what counts as emergent depending on how novelty is understood, and this is reflected in the different ways the concept of emergence is used in the philosophy of mind and in the natural and cognitive sciences. To capture this difference, David Chalmers (2006) drew the distinction between weak and strong emergence. A different distinction has been drawn by O’Connor and Wong (2002) between epistemological and ontological emergence, but this can be incorporated into the distinction between weak and strong emergence becasue ultimately both differentiate between an epistemological emergence couched in terms of higher and lower-level explanations or descriptions and a robust ontological difference between emergent and non-emergent phenomena. Beyond this, accounts of emergence differ in whether novelty is understood as occurring over time or whether it is a phenomenon restricted to a particular time. This difference is meant to be captured in the distinction between synchronic and diachronic emergence.

i. Strong and Weak Emergence

1. Strong Emergence: Novelty as Irreducibility and Downward Causation

The metaphysically interesting aspect of emergence is the question of what it takes for there to be genuinely distinct things. In other words, the question is whether a plausible metaphysical distinction can be made between things that are “nothing over and above” what constitutes them and those things that are “something over and above” their constituent parts. The notion of strong emergence that is predominant in philosophy is meant to capture this ontological distinction that was part of the initial motivation of the British emergentists and which is lacking in discussions of weak emergence.

Though a phenomenon is often said to be strongly emergent because it is not deducible from knowledge of the lower-level domain from which it emerged—as was the case for C.D. Broad—what distinguishes the thesis of strong emergence from a thesis only about our epistemological predicament is that this non-deducibility is in principle a consequence of an ontological distinction.  The question then is what sort of novelty must a property exhibit in order for it to be strongly emergent?

Even reductive physicalists can agree that a property can be novel to a whole even though it is nothing more than the sum of the related properties of the parts of the whole. For instance, a whole weighs as much as the sum of the weights of its parts, yet the weight of the whole is not something that its parts share. In this sense resultant systemic properties, like weight, are novel but not in the sense required for them to be strongly emergent. Also, numerical novelty, the fact that a property is instantiated for the first time, is not enough to make it strongly emergent for, again, that would make many resultant properties emergent, like the first time a specific shape or mass is instantiated in nature.

For this reason the criterion often cited as essential for the ontological autonomy of strong emergents (along with in principle irreducibility or non-deducibility) is causal novelty.  That is, the basic tenet of strong emergentism is that at a certain level of physical complexity novel properties appear that are not shared by the parts of the object they emerge from, that are ontologically irreducible to the more fundamental matter from which they emerge and that contribute causally to the world. That is, emergent properties have new downward causal powers that are irreducible to the causal powers of the properties of their subvenient or subjacent (to be more etymologically correct) base. Ontological emergentism is therefore typically committed not only to novel fundamental properties but also to fundamental emergent laws as was the case with the British emergentists who, with the exception of Alexander, were all committed to downward causation—that is, causation from macroscopic levels to microscopic levels. (It should be noted also that this ontological autonomy of emergents implies the existence of irreducible special sciences.) Thus Timothy O’Connor (1994) defines strong emergent properties as properties that supervene on properties of the parts of a complex object, that are not shared by any of the objects parts, are distinct from any structural property of the complex, and that have downward causal influence on the behavior of the complex’s parts.

However, though downward causal powers are commonly cited along with irreducibility as a criterion for strong emergence, there is no consensus regarding what is known as “Alexander’s dictum” (that is, that for something to be real it must have causal powers) and hence not everyone agrees that strong emergentism requires downward causation. For example, David Chalmers (2006) who is neutral on the question of epiphenomenalism, does not take downward causation to be an essential feature of emergentism. Rather, Chalmers defines a high-level phenomenon as strongly emergent when it is systematically determined by low-level facts but nevertheless truths concerning that phenomenon are in principle not deducible from truths in the lower-level domain. The question is posed by Chalmers in terms of conceptual entailment failure. That is, emergent phenomena are nomologically but not logically supervenient on lower-level facts and therefore novel fundamental laws are needed to connect properties of the two domains.

A different approach is offered by Tim Crane (2001, 2010) who bases his account of strong emergence on the distinction between two kinds of reduction: (1) ontological reduction, which identifies entities in one domain with those in another, more fundamental one, and (2) explanatory reduction: that is, a relation that holds between theories aimed at understanding phenomena of one level of reality in terms of a “lower” level. In other words, one theory, T2, is explanatorily reduced to another, T1, when theory T1 sheds light on the phenomena treated in T2; that is, shows from within theory T1 why T2 is true. Crane argues that the difference between strong emergentism and non-reductive physicalism lies in their respective attitude to reduction: though both non-reductive physicalism and emergentism deny ontological reduction, non-reductive physicalism requires explanatory reduction (at least in principle) whereas the distinguishing feature of emergentism is that it denies explanatory reduction and is committed to an explanatory gap. Crane argues that if you have supervenience with in-principle irreducibility and downward causation then you have dependence without explanatory reduction and, hence, strong emergence.

2. Weak Emergence: Novelty as Unpredictability

Weak emergence is the kind of emergence that is common in the early twenty-first century primarily (though not exclusively) in cognitive science, complex system theory and, generally, scientific discussions of emergence in which the notions of complexity, functional organization, self-organization and non-linearity are central. The core of this position is that a property is emergent if it is a systemic property of a system—a property of a system that none if its smaller parts share—and it is unpredictable or unexpected given the properties and the laws governing the lower-level, more fundamental, domain from which it emerged. Since weak emergence is defined in terms of unpredictability or unexpectedness, it is an epistemological rather than a metaphysical notion. Commonly cited examples of such weak emergent phenomena range from emergent patterns in cellular automata and systemic properties of connectionist networks to phase transitions, termite organization, traffic jams, the flocking patterns of birds, and so on.

Weak emergence is compatible with reduction since a phenomenon may be unpredictable yet also reducible. For instance, processes comprised of many parts may fall under strict deterministic laws yet be unpredictable due to the unforeseeable consequences of minute initial conditions. And, as Chalmers (2006) argues, weak emergence is also compatible with deducibility of the emergent phenomenon from its base, as for instance, in cellular automata in which though higher-level patterns may be unexpected they are in principle deducible given the initial state of the base entities and the basic rules governing the lower level.

Mario Bunge’s “rational emergentism” (1977) is a form of weak emergence according to which emergent properties are identified with systemic properties that none of the parts of the system share and that are reducible to the parts of the system and their organization. Bunge identifies his view as an emergentism of sorts because he claims that, unlike reductionist mechanism it appreciates the novelty of systemic properties. In addition, he thinks of novelty as having a reductive explanation. He calls this “rational” emergence.

William Wimsatt (2000) also defends an account according to which emergence is compatible with reduction. Wimsatt defines emergence negatively as the failure of aggregativity; aggregativity is the state in which “the whole is nothing more than the sum of its parts” in which, that is, systemic properties are the result of the component parts of a system rather than their organization. Contrasting emergence to aggregativity, Wimsatt defines a systemic property as emergent relative to the properties of the parts of a system if the property is dependent on their mode of organization (and is also context-sensitive) rather than solely on the system’s composition. He argues that, in fact, it is aggregativity which is very rare in nature, while emergence is a common phenomenon (even if in different degrees).

Robert Batterman (2002), who focuses on emergence in physics, also believes that emergent phenomena are common in our everyday experience of the physical world. According to Batterman, what is at the heart of the question of emergence is not downward causation or the distinctness of emergent properties, but rather inter-theoretic reduction and, specifically, the limits of the explanatory power of reducing theories. Thus, a property is emergent, according to this view, if it is a property of a complex system at limit values that cannot be derived from lower level, more fundamental theories. As examples of emergent phenomena Batterman cites phase transitions and transitions of magnetic materials from ferromagnetic states to paramagnetic states, phenomena in which novel behavior is exhibited that cannot be reductively explained by the more fundamental theories of statistical mechanics. However, Batterman wants to distinguish explanation from reduction and so claims that though emergent phenomena are irreducible they are not unexplainable per se because they can have non-reductive explanations.

More recently Mark Bedau (1997, 2007, 2008) has argued that the characteristic of weak emergence is that, though macro-phenomena of complex systems are in principle ontologically and causally reducible to micro-phenomena, their reductive explanation is intractably complex, save by derivation through simulation of the system’s microdynamics and external conditions. In other words, though macro-phenomena are explainable in principle in terms of micro-phenomena, these explanations are incompressible, in the sense that they can only be had by “crawling the micro-causal web”—by aggregating and iterating all local micro-interactions over time. Bedau argues that this is the only kind of real emergence and champions what he calls the “radical view” of emergence according to which emergence is a common phenomenon that applies to all novel macro-properties of systems. (He contrasts this to what he calls the “sparse view” which he characterizes as the view that emergence is a rare phenomenon found only in “exotic” phenomena such as consciousness that are beyond the scope of normal science.) However, though this is a weak kind of emergence in that it denies any strong form of downward causation and it involves reducibility of the macro to the micro (even if only in principle), Bedau denies that weak emergence is merely epistemological, or merely “in the mind” since explanations of weak emergent phenomena are incompressible because they reflect the incompressible nature of the micro-causal structure of reality which is an objective feature of complex systems.

Andy Clark (1997, 2001) also holds a weak emergentist view according to which emergent phenomena need not be restricted to unpredictable or unexplainable phenomena but are, instead, systemic phenomena of complex dynamical systems that are the products of collective activity. Clark distinguishes four kinds of emergence. First, emergence as collective self-organization (a system becomes more organized due solely to the collective effects of the local interaction of its parts, such as  flocking patterns of birds, or due to the collective effects of its parts and the environment, such as termite nest building). Second, emergence as unprogrammed functionality, that is, emergent behavior that arises from repeated interaction of an agent with the environment, such as wall-following behavior in “veer and bounce” robots (Clark, 1997). Third, emergence as interactive complexity in which effects, patterns or capacities of a system emerge resulting from complex, cyclic interaction of its components. For example, Bénard and Couette convection cells that result from a repetitive cycle of movement caused by differences in density within a fluid body in which the colder fluid forces the warmer fluid to rise until the latter loses enough heat to descend and cause the former fluid to rise again, and so on. And fourth, emergence as uncompressible unfolding (phenomena that cannot be predicted without simulation). All of these formulations of emergence are compatible with reducibility or in principle predictability and are thus forms of weak emergence. For Clark, emergence picks out the “distinctive way” in which factors conspire to bring about a property, event or pattern and it is “linked to the notion of what variables figure in a good explanation of the behavior of a system.” Thus, Clark’s notion of emergence in complex systems theory is explanatory in that it focuses on explanations in terms of collective variables, that is, variables that focus on higher-level features of complex dynamical systems that do not track properties of the components of the system but, instead, reflect the result of the interaction of multiple agents or their interaction with their environment.

Proponents of weak emergence do not support the strong notion of downward causation that is found in strong emergentist views but, instead, favor one in which higher-level causal powers of a whole can be explained by rules of interaction of its parts, such as feedback loops. Though this kind of view of emergence is predominant in the sciences, it is not exclusive to them. A form of weak emergence within philosophy that denies strong downward causation can be found in John Searle (1992). Searle allows for the existence of “causally emergent system features” such as liquidity, transparency and consciousness that are systemic features of a system that cannot be deduced or predicted from knowledge of causal interactions of lower levels. However, according to Searle, whatever causal effects such features exhibit can be explained by the causal relations of the systems parts, for example, in the case of consciousness, by the behavior and interaction of neurons.

If we make use, for more precision, of the distinction between ontological and explanatory reduction we can see that if we understand strongly emergent phenomena as both ontologically and explanatorily irreducible, as Crane (2010) does, then they are also weakly emergent. However, if strongly emergent phenomena are only ontologically irreducible they may still be, in principle, predictable. For example, even if you deny the identity of heat with mean kinetic energy (perhaps because of multiple realizability) a Laplacean demon could still predict a gas’ heat from the mean kinetic energy of its molecules with the use of “bridge laws” that link the two vocabularies. These bridge laws can be considered to be part of what Crane calls an explanatory reduction. So in such cases, strong emergence does not entail weak emergence. Also it should be noted that weak emergence does not entail strong emergence. A phenomenon can be unpredictable yet also ontologically reducible: perhaps for instance, because systemic properties are subject to indeterministic laws. So a case of weak emergence need not necessarily be a case of strong emergence.

ii. Synchronic and Diachronic Emergence

Another distinction that is made concerning how novelty is understood is the distinction between synchronic and diachronic novelty. The former is novelty exhibited in the properties of a system vis-à-vis the properties of its constituent parts at a particular time; the latter is temporal novelty in the sense that a property or state is novel if it is instantiated for the first time. This distinction leads to distinction between synchronic and diachronic emergence.

In synchronic emergence, articulated by C. D. Broad and predominant in the philosophy of mind, the higher-level, emergent phenomena are simultaneously present with the lower-level phenomena from which they emerge. Usually this form of emergence is stated in terms of supervenience of mental phenomena on subvenient/subjacent neural structures, and so mental states or properties co-exist with states or properties at the neural level. Strong ontological emergence is thus usually understood to be synchronic, “vertical”, emergence. In contrast, diachronic emergence is “horizontal” emergence evolved through time in which the structure from which the novel property emerges exists prior to the emergent. This is typical of the weakly emergent states appealed to in discussions of complex systems, evolution, cosmology, artificial life, and so forth. It can be found in Searle (1992) since he views the relation of the emergent to its base as causal thus, at least in non-synchronic accounts of causation, excluding synchronic emergence.

Because diachronic emergence is emergence over time, novelty is understood in terms of unpredictability of states or properties of a system from past states of that system. And because weak emergence is typically defined in terms of unpredictability it is also usually identified with cases of diachronic emergence. In contrast, in synchronic emergence, which refers to the state of a system at a particular time, novelty revolves around the idea of irreducibility and thus synchronic emergence is usually identified with strong emergence. However, there are formulations of non-supervenience-based strong emergence that are causal and diachronic, such as O’Connor and Wong’s (2005). Note that synchronic emergence could be the result of diachronic emergence but is not entailed by it since, presumably, if God were to create the world exactly as it is in this moment, synchronically emergent phenomena would exist without them being diachronically emergent.

b. Emergence and Supervenience

The British emergentists, and this is especially clear in the writing of C. D. Broad, thought that a necessary feature of emergentism is a relation of the kind we would today call supervenience. Supervenience is a relation of covariation between two sets of properties, subjacent/underlying properties and supervenient properties. Roughly, we say that a set of properties A supervenes on a set of properties B if and only if two things that differ with respect to A-properties will also differ with respect to B-properties. Today, because of the failure of successful reductions, especially in the case of the mental to the physical, and because the relation of supervenience per se doesn’t entail anything about the specific nature of the properties it relates, for example, whether they are distinct or not, it has been seen as a prima facie good candidate for a key feature of the relation between emergents and their subjacent base that can account for the distinctness and dependence of emergents while also adding the restriction of synchronicity. Jaegwon Kim (1999), James van Cleve (1990), Timothy O’Connor (1994), Brian McLaughlin (1997), David Chalmers (2006) and Paul Noordhof (2010) all take nomological strong supervenience to be a necessary feature of emergentism. (For present purposes, following Kim we can define strong supervenience thus: A-properties strongly supervene on B-properties if and only if for any possible worlds w1 and w2 and any individuals x in w1 and y in w2, if x in w1 is B-indiscernible from y in w2, then x in w1 is A-indiscernible from y in w2. Nomological supervenience restricts the range of possible worlds to those that conform to the natural laws).

However, not everyone agrees that the relation of strong supervenience is necessary for strong emergence. Some, like Crane (2001), argue that supervenience is not sufficient for emergence and other proponents of strong emergence have questioned that supervenience is even a necessary condition for emergence. For example, O’Connor (2000, 2003, O’Connor & Wong 2005) now supports a form of dynamical emergence which is causal and non-synchronic. A state of an entity is emergent, in this view, if it instantiates non-structural properties as a causal result of that object’s achieving a complex configuration. O’Connor’s view includes a strong notion of downward causation (and the denial of causal closure–roughly, the principle that all physical effects are entirely determined by, or have their chances entirely determined by, prior physical events) and the possibility that an emergent state can generate another emergent state.

Paul Humphreys (1996, 1997) has also offered an alternative account to supervenience-based emergence according to which emergence of properties is the diachronic result of fusion of lower-level properties, a phenomenon that Humphreys claims is common in the physical realm. That is, properties of the base are fused (thereby ceasing to exist) and give rise to new emergent properties with novel causal powers which are not made up of the old property instances—and, in this sense, the only real phenomenon is the emergent phenomenon. Humphreys offers as a paradigmatic example of such emergence quantum entanglement, in which a system can be in a definite state while its individual parts are not and in which the state of the system determines the states of its parts and not the other way around. It must be noted that Humphreys claims ignorance about whether this is what happens in the case of mental properties. Different formulations of non-supervenience-based emergence can be found in Silberstein and McGeever (1999) who have also argued for ontological emergence in quantum mechanics and, by extension, as a real feature of the natural world, as well as in Bickhard and Campbell’s (2000) “process model” of ontological emergence.

3. Objections to Emergentism

a. The Supervenience Argument

The most usually cited objection to strong emergence, initially formulated by Pepper (1926) and championed today by Jaegwon Kim (1999, 2005), concerns the novel (and downward) causal powers of emergent properties.

Kim’s formulation is based on three basic physicalist assumptions: (1) the principle of causal closure which Kim defines as the principle that if a physical event has a cause at t, then it has a physical cause at t, (2) the principle of causal exclusion according to which if an event e has a sufficient cause at t, no event at t distinct from c can be the cause of e (unless this is a genuine case of causal over-determination), and (3) supervenience. Kim defines mind/body supervenience as follows: mental properties strongly supervene on physical/biological properties, that is, if any system s instantiates a mental property M at t, there necessarily exists a physical property P such that s instantiates P at t, and necessarily anything instantiating P at any time instantiates M at any time.

The gist of the problem is the following. In order for emergent mental properties to have causal powers (and thus to exist, according to what Kim has coined “Alexander’s dictum”) there must be some form of mental causation. However, if this is the case, the principle of causal closure is violated and emergence is in danger of becoming an incoherent position. If mental (and therefore downward) causation is denied and thus causal closure retained, emergent properties become merely epiphenomenal and in this case their existence is threatened.

More specifically, the argument is as follows. According to mind-body supervenience, every time a mental property M is instantiated it supervenes on a physical property P. Now suppose M appears to cause another mental property M¹, the question arises whether the cause of M¹ is indeed M or whether it is M¹’s subvenient/subjacent base P¹ (since according to supervenience M¹ is instantiated by a physical property P¹). Given causal exclusion, it cannot be both, and so, given the supervenience relation, it seems that M¹ occurs because P¹ occurred. Therefore, Kim argues, it seems that M actually causes M¹ by causing the subjacent P¹ and that mental to mental (same level) causation presupposes mental to physical (downward) causation. [Another, more direct, way to put this problem is whether the effect of M is really M¹ or M¹’s subjacent base P¹. I chose an alternative formulation in order for the problem to be more clear to the non-expert reader.] However, Kim continues, given causal closure, P¹ must have a sufficient physical cause P. But given exclusion again, P¹ cannot have two sufficient causes, M and P, and so P is the real cause of P¹ because, if M were the real cause then causal closure would be violated again. Therefore, given supervenience, causal closure and causal exclusion, mental properties are merely epiphenomenal. The tension here for the emergentist, the objection goes, is in the double requirement of supervenience and downward causation in that, on the one hand, we have upward determination and the principle of causal closure of the physical domain, and, on the other hand, we have causally efficacious emergent phenomena. In other words, Kim claims that what seem to be cases of emergent causation are just epiphenomena because ultimately the only way to instantiate an emergent property is to instantiate its base. So, saying that higher level properties are causally efficacious renders any form of non-reductive physicalism, under which Kim includes emergentism, at least implausible and at most incoherent.

Note that this is an objection leveled against cases of strong emergence because in cases of weak emergence that do not make any claims of ontological novelty the causal inheritance principle is preserved—the emergents' causal powers are inherited from the powers of their constitutive parts. For example, a flocking pattern of birds may affect the movement of the individual birds in it but that is nothing more than the effect of the aggregate of all the birds that make it up. Also, this argument applies to cases of supervenience-based emergence which retain base properties intact along with emergent properties, but accounts of emergence that are non-synchronic sidestep the problem of downward causation. So, Kim’s objection does not get off the ground as a retort to O’Connor’s dynamical emergence, Bickhard and Campbell’s process model, Silberstein and McGeever’s quantum mechanical emergence or Humphreys’ fusion emergence.

In the cases where this objection applies, there have been different responses.  Philosophers who want to retain causal closure while also retaining emergent properties have tried to give modified accounts of strong emergence that deny either downward causation or the requirement that emergent properties have novel causal powers. For example, Shoemaker (2001) believes that what must be denied is not the principle of causal closure but, instead, that emergent properties have novel causal powers (the appearance of which he elsewhere attributes to “micro-latent” powers of lower-level entities). This approach, however, is problematic, since it seems to be a requirement for robust strong emergence that emergent properties are not merely epiphenomenal. Another approach has recently been proposed by Cynthia and Graham Macdonald (2010) who attempt to preserve causal closure and to show that it is compatible with emergence by building a metaphysics in which events can co-instantiate in a single instance mental and physical properties thus allowing for mental properties to have causal effects (a view that Peter Wyss (2010) has correctly pointed out is in some respects reminiscent of Samuel Alexander’s). In this schema, the Macdonalds argue, property instances do not belong to different levels (though properties do) and so the problem of downward causation is resolved because, in effect, there is no downward causation in the sense assumed by Kim’s argument (and causal efficacy for emergent and mental properties is preserved, they argue, since if a property has causally efficacious instances that means that the property itself has causal powers). However this view will also seem unsatisfactory to the strong emergentist who wants to retain a robust notion of emergent properties and downward causation.

Other philosophers who want to retain strong emergence have opted for rejecting causal closure instead.  Such a line has been taken by Crane (2001), Hendry (2010) and Lowe (2000) who, however, subsequently offers an account of strong emergence compatible with causal closure (Lowe, 2003).

b. Do Cases of Genuine (Strong) Emergence Exist?

Kim’s supervenience argument is meant to question the very possibility of strongly emergent properties. However, even if strong emergence is possible, there is the further question of whether there are any actual cases of strong emergence in the world.

Brian McLaughlin (1992) who grants that the emergence of novel configurational forces is compatible with the laws of physics and that theories of emergence are coherent and consistent, has argued that there is “not a scintilla of evidence” that there are any real cases of strong emergence to be found in the world. This is a commonly cited objection to emergence readily espoused by reductive physicalists committed to the purely physical nature of all the phenomena that have at different times been called emergent and also raised by Mark Bedau who claims that though weak emergence is very common we have no evidence for cases of strong emergence.

Hempel and Oppenheim (1948) have argued that the unpredictability of emergent phenomena is theory-relative—that is, something is emergent only given the knowledge available at a given time—and does not reflect an ontological distinction. And Ernest Nagel (1960), agreeing that emergence is theory-relative, argued that it is a doctrine concerning “logical facts about formal relations between statements rather than any experimental or even ‘metaphysical’ facts about some allegedly ‘inherent’ traits of properties of objects.” According to these views, theoretical advance and accumulation of new knowledge will lead to the re-classification of what are today considered to be emergent phenomena, as happened with the case of life and chemical bonding of the British emergentists. However, though these objections can be construed as viable objections to some forms of weak emergence they fail to affect strong emergence (which was their target) because it is concerned with in principle unpredictability as a result of irreducibility.

Though this skepticism is shared by a few, some philosophers believe that though strong emergence may be rare, it does exist. Bickhard and Campbell (2000), Silvester and McGeever (1999) and Humphreys (1997) claim that ontological emergence can be found (at least) in quantum mechanics—an interesting proposal, and somewhat ironic given that it was advances in quantum physics in the early 20th century that was supposed to have struck the death blow to the British emergentist tradition. Predominantly, however, the usual candidates for strongly emergent properties are mental properties (phenomenal and/or intentional) that continue to resist any kind of reduction. Chalmers (2006)—because of the explanatory gap—considers consciousness to be the only possible intrinsically strongly emergent phenomenon in nature while O’Connor (2000) has argued that our experience of free will which is, in effect, macroscopic control of behavior, seems to be irreducible and hence strongly suggests that human agency may be strongly emergent. (Stephan (2010) also sees free will as a candidate for a strongly emergent property.)

Another line of response is taken by E. J. Lowe (2000) according to whom emergent mental causes could be in principle out of reach of the physiologist, and so it should not come as a surprise that physical science has not discovered them. Lowe argues that, even if we grant that every physical event has a sufficient immediate physical cause, it is plausible that a mental event could have caused the physical event to have that physical cause. That is not to say that the mental event caused the physical event that caused the physical effect; rather, the mental event linked the two physical events so the effect was jointly caused by a mental and a physical event. Such a case, Lowe argues, would be indistinguishable from the point of view of physiological science from a case in which causal closure held.

Following this line of thought it can be argued that though we do not have actual empirical proof that emergent properties exist, the right attitude to hold is to be open to the possibility of their existence. That is, given that there is no available physiological account of how mental states can cause physical states (or how they can be identical), while at the same time having everyday evidence that they do, as well as a plausible mental—psychological or folk psychological—explanation for it, we have independent grounds to believe that emergent properties could possibly exist.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Alexander, Samuel, Space, Time, and Deity. New York: Dover Publications, 1920.
  • Batterman, Robert W., “Emergence in Physics”. Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy Online.
  • Batterman, Robert W., The Devil in the Details: Asymptotic Reasoning in Explanation, Reduction, and Emergence. Oxford Studies in Philosophy of Science. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press, 2001.
  • Bedau, Mark A. and Humphreys, Paul (eds.), Emergence: Contemporary Readings in Philosophy and Science. London, UK: MIT Press, 2007.
    • A collection of contemporary philosophical and scientific papers on emergence.
  • Bedau, Mark A. “Weak Emergence”, in J. Tomberlin (ed.) Philosophical Perspectives: Mind, Causation and World, vol.11.  Malden, MA: Blackwell, 1997. pp. 375-399.
  • Batterman, Robert W. “Is Weak Emergence Just in the Mind?” Minds and Machines 18, 2008: 443-459.
    • On weak emergence as computational irreducibility and explanatory incompressibility respectively.
  • Bickhard, M. & D.T. Campbell, “Emergence”, in P.B. Andersen, C. Emmerche, N. O. Finnemann & P. V. Christiansen (eds), Downward causation. Aarhus: Aarhus University Press, 2000.
  • Bickhard, M. and D.T. Campbell, “Physicalism, Emergence and Downward Causation” Axiomathes, October 2010.
    • On the “process model” of emergence.
  • Broad, C.D., The Mind and Its Place in Nature. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1925.
    • The classical formulation of British emergentist tradition.
  • Bunge, Mario, “Emergence and the Mind”. Neuroscience 2, 1977: 501-509.
    • On “rational emergence,” a form of weak emergence.
  • Chalmers, David, “Strong and Weak Emergence”.  In P. Clayton and P. Davies, eds, The Re-emergence of Emergence Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006.
    • On weak and strong emergence.
  • Clark, Andy, Being There: Putting Brain, Body, and World Together Again. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1997.
  • Clark, Andy, Mindware: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Cognitive Science. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 2001.
    • On the four types of weak emergence that Clark identifies in the cognitive sciences.
  • Crane, Tim, “Cosmic Hermeneutics vs. Emergence: The Challenge of the Explanatory Gap” in Emergence in Mind, eds. Cynthia Macdonald and Graham Macdonald. New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
  • Crane, Tim, “The Significance of Emergence” in B. Loewer and G. Gillett (eds) Physicalism and Its Discontents. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
    • On the relation of emergence to non-reductive physicalism, reduction and theexplanatory gap.
  • Hempel, Carl Gustav and Paul Oppenheim (1948), “Studies in the Logic of Explanation”, in Hempel, C. G. Aspects of Scientific Explanation. New York: Free Press, 1965.
    • An exposition of the objection that emergence is only theory relative and not a genuine phenomenon in nature.
  • Humphreys, Paul, “How Properties Emerge.” Philosophy of Science, 1997(a), 64: 1-17.
  • Humphreys, Paul, “Emergence, Not Supervenience.” Philosophy of Science, 1997(b), 64: 337-345.
    • On non-supervenience - based emergence as fusion of properties.
  • Hendry, Robin Findlay, “Emergence vs. Reduction in Chemistry” in Mcdonald & Mcdonald (2010).
    • Contains an argument against causal closure and for downward causation in chemistry in support of the position that emergentism is at least as supported by empirical evidence as non-reductive physicalism.
  • Kim, Jaegwon, “‘Downward Causation’ in Emergentism and Nonreductive Physicalism”, in Beckermann, Flohr, and Kim (eds), Emergence or Reduction? Essays on the Prospects of Nonreductive Physicalism. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1992.
  • Kim, Jaegwon,“Making Sense of Emergence”. Philosophical Studies, 95, 1999: 3-36.
  • Kim, Jaegwon, Physicalism, or Something Near Enough.  Princeton and Oxford: Princeton University Press, 2005.
    • Contain analyses of non-reductive physicalism and emergence and a main source of criticism of these views, including the supervenience argument.
  • Lewes, George Henry. Problems of Life and Mind. Vol 2. London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Turbner, & Co., 1875.
      • Another of the historical texts of the British emergentist tradition in which the term “emergent” is coined.
  • Lowe, J., “Causal Closure Principles and Emergentism.” Philosophy, 75 (4), 2000.: 571-585.
  • Lowe, J., “Physical Causal Closure and the Invisibility of Mental Causation” in Sven Walter and Heinz-Dieter Heckmann (eds.) Physicalism and Mental Causation: The Metaphysics of Mind and Action. UK: Imprint Academic, 2003.
    • For an idea of what it could be like for there to be mental forces in principle out of reach of the physiologist yet also consistent with causal closure.
  • Macdonald, C. and G. Macdonald, eds., Emergence in Mind. New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
    • A collection of philosophical essays on emergence covering a wide range of issues from explanation and reduction to free will and group agency.
  • McLaughlin, Brian P., “Emergence and Supervenience.” Intellectica, 2, 1997: 25-43.
  • McLaughlin, Brian P.,“The Rise and Fall of British Emergentism” in Beckerman, Flor and J.Kim (eds.), Emergence or Reduction? Berlin, Germany: Walter DeGruyter &Co., 1992.
    • The most comprehensive critical historical overview of British emergentism.
  • Mill, J.S., A System of Logic Ratiocinative and Inductive.  London: Longmans, Green and Co., 1930.
    • For Mill’s discussion of homopathic and heteropathic effects and laws that marked the beginning of the British emergentist tradition.
  • Mitchell, Sandra D., Unsimple Truths. Chicago and London: The University of Chicago Press, 2009.
    • A very good account of emergence in science.
  • Morgan, C.L., Emergent Evolution. London: Williams and Norgate, 1923.
  • Nagel, Ernest, The Structure of Science. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1961.
    • On the objection that emergence is only theory relative.
  • Noordhof, Paul, “Emergent Causation and Property Causation” in Emergence in Mind, eds.  Cynthia Macdonald and Graham Macdonald, New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
  • O’Connor, Timothy, “Causality, Mind and Free Will”. Philosophical Perspectives, 14, 2000: 105-117.
  • O’Connor, Timothy, “Emergent Individuals”. The Philosophical Quarterly, 53, 213, 2003: 540-555.
  • O’Connor, Timothy, Emergent Properties”. American Philosophical Quarterly, 31, 1994: 91-104.
  • O’Connor, Timothy,  & Hong Yu Wong, “The Metaphysics of Emergence”. Noûs 39, 4, 2005: 58–678.
    • In defense of strongly emergent properties.
  • Papineau, David, “Why Supervenience?” Analysis, 50, 2 (1990): 66-71.
  • Pepper, Stephen C., “Emergence”. Journal of Philosophy, 23, 1926: 241- 245.
    • The original formulation of the objection against downward causation.
  • Searle, J.R., The Rediscovery of Mind. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1992.
    • Contains a philosophical discussion supporting a weak form of causal emergence for consciousness.
  • Shoemaker, S., “Realization and Mental Causation” in Physicalism and Its Discontents, Barry Loewer and Carl Gillett (eds.). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001: 74-98.
  • Silberstein, Michael and John McGeever, “The Search for Ontological Emergence”. The Philosophical Quarterly, 49, 1999: 182-200.
    • An account of strong emergence based on the relational holism of quantum states.
  • Sperry, R. W. “A Modified Concept of Consciousness” Psychological Review, 76, 6, 1969: 532-536
  • Sperry, R.W.  “Mind-Brain Interaction: Mentalism, Yes; Dualism, No”. Neuroscience, 5, 1980: 195-206.
    • An argument for the strong emergence of consciousness involving downward causation from a neuroscientist’s perspective.
  • Stephan, Achim, “Varieties of Emergentism.” Evolution and Cognition, 49, vol. 5, no.1, 1999: 49-59.
    • On different kinds of emergentism and how they relate.
  • Stephan, Achim, “An Emergentist's Perspective on the Problem of Free Will” in Macdonald & Macdonald  (2010).
    • On free will as a strongly emergent property
  • Wimsatt, William C., “Emergence as Non-Aggregativity and the Biases of Reductionisms”. Foundations of Science, 5, 3, 2000: 269-297.
    • On a view of emergence as non-aggregativity that is compatible with reduction.
  • Wyss, Peter, “”Identity with a Difference: Comments on Macdonald and Macdonald in Macdonald & Macdonald  (2010).

Author Information

Elly Vintiadis
Naval Staff and Command College
U. S. A.

The Infinite

Working with the infinite is tricky business. Zeno’s paradoxes first alerted philosophers to this in 450 B.C.E. when he argued that a fast runner such as Achilles has an infinite number of places to reach during the pursuit of a slower runner. Since then, there has been a struggle to understand how to use the notion of infinity in a coherent manner. This article concerns the significant and controversial role that the concepts of infinity and the infinite play in the disciplines of philosophy, physical science, and mathematics.

Philosophers want to know whether there is more than one coherent concept of infinity; which entities and properties are infinitely large, infinitely small, infinitely divisible, and infinitely numerous; and what arguments can justify answers one way or the other.

Here are four suggested examples of these different ways to be infinite. The density of matter at the center of a black hole is infinitely large. An electron is infinitely small. An hour is infinitely divisible. The integers are infinitely numerous. These four claims are ordered from most to least controversial, although all four have been challenged in the philosophical literature.

This article also explores a variety of other questions about the infinite. Is the infinite something indefinite and incomplete, or is it complete and definite? What did Thomas Aquinas mean when he said God is infinitely powerful? Was Gauss, who was one of the greatest mathematicians of all time, correct when he made the controversial remark that scientific theories involve infinities merely as idealizations and merely in order to make for easy applications of those theories, when in fact all physically real entities are finite? How did the invention of set theory change the meaning of the term “infinite”? What did Cantor mean when he said some infinities are smaller than others? Quine said the first three sizes of Cantor’s infinities are the only ones we have reason to believe in. Mathematical Platonists disagree with Quine. Who is correct? We shall see that there are deep connections among all these questions.

Table of Contents

  1. What “Infinity” Means
    1. Actual, Potential, and Transcendental Infinity
    2. The Rise of the Technical Terms
  2. Infinity and the Mind
  3. Infinity in Metaphysics
  4. Infinity in Physical Science
    1. Infinitely Small and Infinitely Divisible
    2. Singularities
    3. Idealization and Approximation
    4. Infinity in Cosmology
  5. Infinity in Mathematics
    1. Infinite Sums
    2. Infinitesimals and Hyperreals
    3. Mathematical Existence
    4. Zermelo-Fraenkel Set Theory
    5. The Axiom of Choice and the Continuum Hypothesis
  6. Infinity in Deductive Logic
    1. Finite and Infinite Axiomatizability
    2. Infinitely Long Formulas
    3. Infinitely Long Proofs
    4. Infinitely Many Truth Values
    5. Infinite Models
    6. Infinity and Truth
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. What “Infinity” Means

The term “the infinite” refers to whatever it is that the word “infinity” correctly applies to. For example, the infinite integers exist just in case there is an infinity of integers. We also speak of infinite quantities, but what does it mean to say a quantity is infinite? In 1851, Bernard Bolzano argued in The Paradoxes of the Infinite that, if a quantity is to be infinite, then the measure of that quantity also must be infinite. Bolzano’s point is that we need a clear concept of infinite number in order to have a clear concept of infinite quantity. This idea of Bolzano’s has led to a new way of speaking about infinity, as we shall see.

The term “infinite” can be used for many purposes. The logician Alfred Tarski used it for dramatic purposes when he spoke about trying to contact his wife in Nazi-occupied Poland in the early 1940s. He complained, “We have been sending each other an infinite number of letters. They all disappear somewhere on the way. As far as I know, my wife has received only one letter.” (Feferman 2004, p. 137) Although the meaning of a term is intimately tied to its use, we can tell only a very little about the meaning of the term from Tarski’s use of it to exaggerate for dramatic effect.

Looking back over the last 2,500 years of use of the term “infinite,” three distinct senses stand out: actually infinite, potentially infinite, and transcendentally infinite. These will be discussed in more detail below, but briefly the concept of potential infinity treats infinity as an unbounded or non-terminating process developing over time. By contrast, the concept of actual infinity treats the infinite as timeless and complete. Transcendental infinity is the least precise of the three concepts and is more commonly used in discussions of metaphysics and theology to suggest transcendence of human understanding or human capability.

To give some examples, the set of integers is actually infinite, and so is the number of locations (points of space) between London and Moscow. The maximum length of grammatical sentences in English is potentially infinite, and so is the total amount of memory in a Turing machine, an ideal computer. An omnipotent being’s power is transcendentally infinite.

For purposes of doing mathematics and science, the actual infinite has turned out to be the most useful of the three concepts. Using the idea proposed by Bolzano that was mentioned above, the concept of the actual infinite was precisely defined in 1888 when Richard Dedekind redefined the term “infinity” for use in set theory and Georg Cantor made the infinite, in the sense of infinite set, an object of mathematical study. Before this turning point, the philosophical community generally believed Aristotle’s concept of potential infinity should be the concept used in mathematics and science.

a. Actual, Potential, and Transcendental Infinity

The Ancient Greeks generally conceived of the infinite as formless, characterless, indefinite, indeterminate, chaotic, and unintelligible. The term had negative connotations and was especially vague, having no clear criteria for distinguishing the finite from the infinite. In his treatment of Zeno’s paradoxes about infinite divisibility, Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) made a positive step toward clarification by distinguishing two different concepts of infinity, potential infinity and actual infinity. The latter is also called complete infinity and completed infinity. The actual infinite is not a process in time; it is an infinity that exists wholly at one time. By contrast, Aristotle spoke of the potentially infinite as a never-ending process over time, but which is finite at any specific time.

The word “potential” is being used in a technical sense. A potential swimmer can learn to become an actual swimmer, but a potential infinity cannot become an actual infinity. Aristotle argued that all the problems involving reasoning with infinity are really problems of improperly applying the incoherent concept of actual infinity instead of the coherent concept of potential infinity. (See Aristotle’s Physics, Book III, for his account of infinity.)

For its day, this was a successful way of treating Zeno’s Achilles paradox since, if Zeno had confined himself to using only potential infinity, he would not have been able to develop his paradoxical argument. Here is why. Zeno said that to go from the start to the finish line, the runner must reach the place that is halfway-there, then after arriving at this place he still must reach the place that is half of that remaining distance, and after arriving there he again must reach the new place that is now halfway to the goal, and so on. These are too many places to reach because there is no end to these place since for any one there is another. Zeno made the mistake, according to Aristotle, of supposing that this infinite process needs completing when it really doesn’t; the finitely long path from start to finish exists undivided for the runner, and it is Zeno the mathematician who is demanding the completion of such a process. Without that concept of a completed infinite process there is no paradox.

Although today’s standard treatment of the Achilles paradox disagrees with Aristotle and says Zeno was correct to use the concept of a completed infinity and to imply the runner must go to an actual infinity of places in a finite time, Aristotle had so many other intellectual successes that his ideas about infinity dominated the Western world for the next two thousand years.

Even though Aristotle promoted the belief that “the idea of the actual infinite−of that whose infinitude presents itself all at once−was close to a contradiction in terms…,” (Moore 2001, 40) during those two thousand years others did not treat it as a contradiction in terms. Archimedes, Duns Scotus, William of Ockham, Gregory of Rimini, and Leibniz made use of it. Archimedes used it, but had doubts about its legitimacy. Leibniz used it but had doubts about whether it was needed.

Here is an example of how Gregory of Rimini argued in the fourteenth century for the coherence of the concept of actual infinity:

If God can endlessly add a cubic foot to a stone—which He can—then He can create an infinitely big stone. For He need only add one cubic foot at some time, another half an hour later, another a quarter of an hour later than that, and so on ad infinitum. He would then have before Him an infinite stone at the end of the hour. (Moore 2001, 53)

Leibniz envisioned the world as being an actual infinity of mind-like monads, and in (Leibniz 1702) he freely used the concept of being infinitesimally small in his development of the calculus in mathematics.

The term “infinity” that is used in contemporary mathematics and science is based on a technical development of this earlier, informal concept of actual infinity. This technical concept was not created until late in the 19th century.

b. The Rise of the Technical Terms

In the centuries after the decline of ancient Greece, the word “infinite” slowly changed its meaning in Medieval Europe. Theologians promoted the idea that God is infinite because He is limitless, and this at least caused the word “infinity” to lose its negative connotations. Eventually during the Medieval Period, the word had come to mean endless, unlimited, and immeasurable–but not necessarily chaotic. The question of its intelligibility and conceivability by humans was disputed.

The term actual infinity is now very different. There are actual infinities in the technical, post-1880s sense, which are neither endless, unlimited, nor immeasurable. A line segment one meter long is a good example. It is not endless because it is finitely long, and it is not a process because it is timeless. It is not unlimited because it is limited by both zero and one. It is not immeasurable because its length measure is one meter. Nevertheless, the one meter line is infinite in the technical sense because it has an actual infinity of sub-segments, and it has an actual infinity of distinct points. So, there definitely has been a conceptual revolution.

This can be very shocking to those people who are first introduced to the technical term “actual infinity.” It seems not to be the kind of infinity they are thinking about. The crux of the problem is that these people really are using a different concept of infinity. The sense of infinity in ordinary discourse these days is either the Aristotelian one of potential infinity or the medieval one that requires infinity to be endless, immeasurable, and perhaps to have connotations of perfection, inconceivability, and paradox. This article uses the name transcendental infinity for the medieval concept although there is no generally accepted name for the concept. A transcendental infinity transcends human limits and detailed knowledge; it might be incapable of being described by a precise theory. It might also be a cluster of concepts rather than a single one.

Those people who are surprised when first introduced to the technical term “actual infinity” are probably thinking of either potential infinity or transcendental infinity, and that is why, in any discussion of infinity, some philosophers will say that an appeal to the technical term “actual infinity” is changing the subject. Another reason why there is opposition to actual infinities is that they have so many counter-intuitive properties. For example, consider a continuous line that has an actual infinity of points. A single point on this line has no next point! Also, a one-dimensional continuous curve can fill a two-dimensional area. Equally counterintuitive is the fact that some actually infinite numbers are smaller than other actually infinite numbers. Looked at more optimistically, though, most other philosophers will say the rise of this technical term is yet another example of how the discovery of a new concept has propelled civilization forward.

Resistance to the claim that there are actual infinities has had two other sources. One is the belief that actual infinities cannot be experienced. The second is the belief that use of the concept of actual infinity leads to paradoxes, such as Zeno’s. Because the standard solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes makes use of calculus, the birth of the new technical definition of actual infinity is intimately tied to the development of calculus and thus to properly defining the mathematician’s real line, the linear continuum. Briefly, the reason is that science needs calculus; calculus needs the continuum; the continuum needs a very careful definition; and the best definition requires there to be actual infinities (not merely potential infinities) in the micro-structure and the overall macro-structure of the continuum.

Defining the continuum involves defining real numbers because the linear continuum is the intended model of the theory of real numbers just as the plane is the intended model for the theory of ordinary two-dimensional geometry. It was eventually realized by mathematicians that giving a careful definition to the continuum and to real numbers requires formulating their definitions within set theory. As part of that formulation, mathematicians found a good way to define a rational number in the language of set theory; then they defined a real number to be a certain pair of actually infinite sets of rational numbers. The continuum’s eventual definition required it to be an actually infinite collection whose elements are themselves infinite sets. The details are too complex to be presented here, but the curious reader can check any textbook in classical real analysis. The intuitive picture is that any interval or segment of the continuum is a continuum, and any continuum is a very special infinite set of points that are packed so closely together that there are no gaps. A continuum is perfectly smooth. This smoothness is reflected in there being a great many real numbers between any two real numbers.

Calculus is the area of mathematics that is more applicable to science than any other area. It can be thought of as a technique for treating a continuous change as being composed of an infinite number of infinitesimal changes. When calculus is applied to physical properties capable of change such as spatial location, ocean salinity or an electrical circuit’s voltage, these properties are represented with continuous variables that have real numbers for their values. These values are specific real numbers, not ranges of real numbers and not just rational numbers. Achilles’ location along the path to his goal is such a property.

It took many centuries to rigorously develop the calculus. A very significant step in this direction occurred in 1888 when Richard Dedekind re-defined the term “infinity” and when Georg Cantor used that definition to create the first set theory, a theory that eventually was developed to the point where it could be used for embedding all classical mathematical theories. See the example in the Zeno's Paradoxes article of how Dedekind used set theory and his new idea of "cuts" to define the real numbers in terms of infinite sets of rational numbers. In this way additional rigor was given to the concepts of mathematics, and it encouraged more mathematicians to accept the notion of actually infinite sets. What this embedding requires is first defining the terms of any mathematical theory in the language of set theory, then translating the axioms and theorems of the mathematical theory into sentences of set theory, and then showing that these theorems follow logically from the axioms. (The axioms of any theory, such as set theory, are the special sentences of the theory that can always be assumed during the process of deducing the other theorems of the theory.)

The new technical treatment of infinity that originated with Dedekind in 1888 and was adopted by Cantor in his new set theory provided a definition of "infinite set" rather than simply “infinite.” Dedekind says an infinite set is a set that is not finite. The notion of a finite set can be defined in various ways. We might define it numerically as a set having n members, where n is some non-negative integer. Dedekind found an essentially equivalent definition of finite set (assuming the axiom of choice, which will be discussed later), but Dedekind’s definition does not require mentioning numbers:

A (Dedekind) finite set is a set for which there exists no one-to-one correspondence between it and one of its proper subsets.

By placing the finger-tips of your left hand on the corresponding finger-tips of your right hand, you establish a one-to-one correspondence between the set of fingers of each hand; in that way you establish that there are the same number of fingers on each of your hands, without your needing to count the fingers. More generally, there is a one-to-one correspondence between two sets when each member of one set can be paired off with a unique member of the other set, so that neither set has an unpaired member.

Here is a one-to-one correspondence between the natural numbers and its proper subset of even numbers, demonstrating that the natural numbers are infinite:

1 2 3 4
2 4 6 8

Informally expressed, any infinite set can be matched up to a part of itself; so the whole is equivalent to a part. This is a surprising definition because, before this definition was adopted, the idea that actually infinite wholes are equinumerous with some of their parts was taken as clear evidence that the concept of actual infinity is inherently paradoxical. For a systematic presentation of the many alternative ways to successfully define “infinite set” non-numerically, see (Tarski 1924).

Dedekind’s new definition of "infinite" is defining an actually infinite set, not a potentially infinite set because Dedekind appealed to no continuing operation over time. The concept of a potentially infinite set is then given a new technical definition by saying a potentially infinite set is a growing, finite subset of an actually infinite set. Cantor expressed the point this way:

In order for there to be a variable quantity in some mathematical study, the “domain” of its variability must strictly speaking be known beforehand through a definition. However, this domain cannot itself be something variable…. Thus this “domain” is a definite, actually infinite set of values. Thus each potential infinite…presupposes an actual infinite. (Cantor 1887)

The new idea is that the potentially infinite set presupposes an actually infinite one. If this is correct, then Aristotle’s two notions of the potential infinite and actual infinite have been redefined and clarified.

Two sets are the same if any member of one is a member of the other, and vice versa. Order of the members is irrelevant to the identity of the set, and to the size of the set. Two sets are the same size if there exists a one-to-one correspondence between them. This definition of same size was recommended by both Cantor and Frege. Cantor defined “finite” by saying a set is finite if it is in one-to-one correspondence with the set {1, 2, 3, …, n} for some positive integer n; and he said a set is infinite if it is not finite.

Cardinal numbers are measures of the sizes of sets. There are many definitions of what a cardinal number is, but what is essential for cardinal numbers is that two sets have the same cardinal just in case there is a one-to-one correspondence between them; and set A has a smaller cardinal number than a set B (and so set A has fewer members than B) provided there is a one-to-one correspondence between A and a subset of B, but B is not the same size as A. In this sense, the set of even integers does not have fewer members than the set of all integers, although intuitively you might think it does.

How big is infinity? This question does not make sense for either potential infinity or transcendental infinity, but it does for actual infinity. Finite cardinal numbers such as 0, 1, 2, and 3 are measures of the sizes of finite sets, and transfinite cardinal numbers are measures of the sizes of actually infinite sets. The transfinite cardinals are aleph-null, aleph-one, aleph-two, and so on; we represent them with the numerals ℵ0, ℵ1, ℵ2, .... The smallest infinite size is ℵ0 which is the size of the set of natural numbers, and it is said to be countably infinite (or denumerably infinite or enumerably infinite). The other alephs are measures of the uncountable infinities. However, these are somewhat misleading terms since no process of counting is involved. Nobody would have the time to count from 0 to any aleph.

The set of even integers, the set of natural numbers and the set of rational numbers all can be shown to have the same size, but surprisingly they all are smaller than the set of real numbers. The set of points in the continuum and in any interval of the continuum turns out to be larger than ℵ0, although how much larger is still an open problem, called the continuum problem. A popular but controversial suggestion is that a continuum is of size ℵ1, the next larger size.

When creating set theory, mathematicians did not begin with the belief that there would be so many points between any two points in the continuum nor with the belief that for any infinite cardinal there is a larger cardinal. These were surprising consequences discovered by Cantor. To many philosophers, this surprise is evidence that what is going on is not invention but rather is discovery about a mind-independent reality.

The intellectual community has always been wary of actually infinite sets. Before the discovery of how to embed calculus within set theory (a process that is also called giving calculus a basis in set theory), it could have been more easily argued that science does not need actual infinities. The burden of proof has now shifted, and the default position is that actual infinities are indispensable in mathematics and science, and anyone who wants to do without them must show that removing them does not do too much damage and has additional benefits. There are no known successful attempts to reconstruct the theories of mathematical physics without basing them on mathematical objects such as numbers and sets, but for one attempt to do so using second-order logic, see (Field 1980).

Here is why some mathematicians believe the set-theoretic basis is so important:

Just as chemistry was unified and simplified when it was realized that every chemical compound is made of atoms, mathematics was dramatically unified when it was realized that every object of mathematics can be taken to be the same kind of thing. There are now other ways than set theory to unify mathematics, but before set theory there was no such unifying concept. Indeed, in the Renaissance, mathematicians hesitated to add x2 to x3, since the one was an area and the other a volume. Since the advent of set theory, one can correctly say that all mathematicians are exploring the same mental universe. (Rucker 1982, p. 64)

But the significance of this basis can be exaggerated. The existence of the basis does not imply that mathematics is set theory.

Paradoxes soon were revealed within set theory—by Cantor himself and then others—so the quest for a more rigorous definition of the mathematical continuum continued. Cantor’s own paradox surfaced in 1895 when he asked whether the set of all cardinal numbers has a cardinal number. Cantor showed that, if it does, then it doesn’t. Surely the set of all sets would have the greatest cardinal number, but Cantor showed that for any cardinal number there is a greater cardinal number.  [For more details about this and the other paradoxes, see (Suppes 1960).] The most famous paradox of set theory is Russell’s Paradox of 1901. He showed that the set of all sets that are not members of themselves is both a member of itself and not a member of itself. Russell wrote that the paradox “put an end to the logical honeymoon that I had been enjoying.”

These and other paradoxes were eventually resolved satisfactorily by finding revised axioms of set theory that permit the existence of enough well-behaved sets so that set theory is not crippled [that is, made incapable of providing a basis for mathematical theories] and yet the axioms do not permit the existence of too many sets, the ill-behaved sets such as Cantor’s set of all cardinals and Russell’s set of all sets that are not members of themselves. Finally, by the mid-20th century, it had become clear that, despite the existence of competing set theories, Zermelo-Fraenkel’s set theory (ZF) was the best way or the least radical way to revise set theory in order to avoid all the known paradoxes and problems while at the same time preserving enough of our intuitive ideas about sets that it deserved to be called a set theory, and at this time most mathematicians would have agreed that the continuum had been given a proper basis in ZF. See (Kleene 1967, pp. 189-191) for comments on this agreement about ZF’s success and for a list of the ZF axioms and for a detailed explanation of why each axiom deserves to be an axiom.

Because of this success, and because it was clear enough that the concept of infinity used in ZF does not lead to contradictions, and because it seemed so evident how to use the concept in other areas of mathematics and science where the term “infinity” was being used, the definition of the concept of "infinite set" within ZF was claimed by many philosophers to be the paradigm example of how to provide a precise and fruitful definition of a philosophically significant concept. Much less attention was then paid to critics who had complained that we can never use the word “infinity” coherently because infinity is ineffable or inherently paradoxical.

Nevertheless there was, and still is, serious philosophical opposition to actually infinite sets and to ZF's treatment of the continuum, and this has spawned the programs of constructivism, intuitionism, finitism and ultrafinitism, all of whose advocates have philosophical objections to actual infinities. Even though there is much to be said in favor of replacing a murky concept with a clearer, technical concept, there is always the worry that the replacement is a change of subject that has not really solved the problems it was designed for. More discussion of the role of infinity in mathematics and science continues in later sections of this article.

2. Infinity and the Mind

Can humans grasp the concept of the infinite? This seems to be a profound question. Ever since Zeno, intellectuals have realized that careless reasoning about infinity can lead to paradox and perhaps “defeat” the human mind.

Some critics of infinity argue not just that paradox can occur but that paradox is essential to, or inherent in, the use of the concept of infinity, so the infinite is beyond the grasp of the human mind. However, this criticism applies more properly to some forms of transcendental infinity rather than to either actual infinity or potential infinity. This is a consequence of the development of set theory as we shall see in a later section.

A second reason to believe humans cannot grasp infinity is that the concept must contain an infinite number of sub-concepts, which is too many for our finite minds. A counter to this reason is to defend the psychological claim that if a person succeeds in thinking about infinity, it does not follow that the person needs to have an actually infinite number of ideas in mind at one time.

A third reason to believe the concept of infinity is beyond human understanding is that to have the concept one must have some accurate mental picture of infinity. Thomas Hobbes, who believed that all thinking is based on imagination, might remark that nobody could picture an infinite number of grains of sand at once. However, most contemporary philosophers of psychology believe mental pictures are not essential to having a concept. Regarding the concept of dog, you might have a picture of a brown dog in your mind, and I might have a picture of a black dog in mine, but I can still understand you perfectly well when you say dogs frequently chase cats.

The main issue here is whether we can coherently think about infinity to the extent of being said to have the concept. Here is a simple argument that we can: If we understand negation and have the concept of finite, then the concept of infinite is merely the concept of not-finite. A second argument says the apparent consistency of set theory indicates that infinity in the technical sense of actual infinity is well within our grasp. And since potential infinity is definable in terms of actual infinity, it, too, is within our grasp.

Assuming that infinity is within our grasp, what is it that we are grasping? Philosophers disagree on the answer. In 1883, Cantor said, regarding mentally grasping an infinite set or any other set,

A set is a Many which allows itself to be thought of as a One.

Notice the dependence of a set upon thought. Cantor eventually clarified what he meant and was clear that he did not want set existence to depend on mental capability. What he really believed is that a set is a collection of well-defined and distinct objects that exists independently of being thought of, but that might be thought of by a powerful enough mind. Some contemporary philosophers want to avoid these metaphysical commitments, and they recommend saying a set is whatever satisfies the axioms of the best set theory.

3. Infinity in Metaphysics

There is a concept which corrupts and upsets all others. I refer not to Evil, whose limited realm is that of ethics; I refer to the infinite. —Jorge Luis Borges.

Shakespeare declared, “The will is infinite.” Is he correct or just exaggerating? Critics of Shakespeare, interpreted literally, might argue that the will is basically a product of different brain states. Because a person’s brain contains approximately 1027 atoms, these have only a finite number of configurations or states, and so, regardless of whether we interpret Shakespeare’s remark as implying that the will is unbounded (is potentially infinite) or the will produces an infinite number of brain states (is actually infinite), the will is not infinite. But perhaps Shakespeare was speaking metaphorically and did not intend to be taken literally, or perhaps he meant to use some version of transcendental infinity that makes infinity be somehow beyond human comprehension.

Contemporary Continental philosophers often speak that way. Emmanuel Levinas says the infinite is another name for the Other, for the existence of other conscious beings besides ourselves whom we are ethically responsible for. We “face the infinite” in the sense of facing a practically incomprehensible and unlimited number of possibilities upon encountering another conscious being. (See Levinas 1961.) If we ask what sense of “infinite” is being used by Levinas, it may be yet another concept of infinity, or it may be some kind of transcendental infinity. Another interpretation is that he is exaggerating about the number of possibilities and should say instead that there are too many possibilities to be faced when we encounter another conscious being and that the possibilities are not readily predictable because other conscious beings make free choices, the causes of which often are not known even to the person making the choice.

Leibniz was one of the few persons in earlier centuries who believed in actually infinite sets, but he did not believe in infinite numbers. Cantor did. Referring to his own discovery of the transfinite cardinals ℵ0, ℵ1, ℵ2, .... and their properties, Cantor claimed his work was revealing God’s existence and that these mathematical objects were in the mind of God. He claimed God gave humans the concept of the infinite so that they could reflect on His perfection. Influential German neo-Thomists such as Constantin Gutberlet agreed with Cantor. Some Jesuit math instructors claim that by taking a calculus course and set theory course and understanding infinity, students are getting closer to God. Their critics complain that these mystical ideas about infinity and God are too speculative.

When metaphysicians speak of infinity they use all three concepts: potential infinity, actual infinity, and transcendental infinity. But when they speak about God being infinite, they are usually interested in implying that God is beyond human understanding or that there is a lack of a limit on particular properties of God, such as God's goodness and knowledge and power.

The connection between infinity and God exists in nearly all of the world’s religions. It is prominent in Hindu, Muslim, Jewish, and Christian literature. For example, in chapter 11 of the Bhagavad Gita of Hindu scripture, Krishna says, “O Lord of the universe, I see You everywhere with infinite form....”

Plato did not envision God (the Demi-urge) as infinite because he viewed God as perfect, and he believed anything perfect must be limited and thus not infinite because the infinite was defined as an unlimited, unbounded, indefinite, unintelligible chaos.

But the meaning of the term “infinite” slowly began to change. Over six hundred years later, the Neo-Platonist philosopher Plotinus was one of the first important Greek philosophers to equate God with the infinite−although he did not do so explicitly. He said instead that any idea abstracted from our finite experience is not applicable to God. He probably believed that if God were finite in some aspect, then there could be something beyond God and therefore God wouldn’t be “the One.” Plotinus was influential in helping remove the negative connotations that had accompanied the concept of the infinite. One difficulty here, though, is that it is unclear whether metaphysicians have discovered that God is identical with the transcendentally infinite or whether they are simply defining “God” to be that way. A more severe criticism is that perhaps they are just defining “infinite” (in the transcendental sense) as whatever God is.

Augustine, who merged Platonic philosophy with the Christian religion, spoke of God “whose understanding is infinite” for “what are we mean wretches that dare presume to limit His knowledge?” Augustine wrote that the reason God can understand the infinite is that “...every infinity is, in a way we cannot express, made finite to God....” [City of God, Book XII, ch. 18] This is an interesting perspective. Medieval philosophers debated whether God could understand infinite concepts other than Himself, not because God had limited understanding, but because there was no such thing as infinity anywhere except in God.

The medieval philosopher Thomas Aquinas, too, said God has infinite knowledge. He definitely did not mean potentially infinite knowledge. The technical definition of actual infinity might be useful here. If God is infinitely knowledgeable, this can be understood perhaps as meaning that God knows the truth values of all declarative sentences and that the set of these sentences is actually infinite.

Aquinas argued in his Summa Theologia that, although God created everything, nothing created by God can be actually infinite. His main reason was that anything created can be counted, yet if an infinity were created, then the count would be infinite, but no infinite numbers exist to do the counting (as Aristotle had also said). In his day this was a better argument than today because Cantor created (or discovered) infinite numbers in the late 19th century.

René Descartes believed God was actually infinite, and he remarked that the concept of actual infinity is so awesome that no human could have created it or deduced it from other concepts, so any idea of infinity that humans have must have come from God directly. Thus God exists. Descartes is using the concept of infinity to produce a new ontological argument for God’s existence.

David Hume, and many other philosophers, raised the problem that if God has infinite power then there need not be evil in the world, and if God has infinite goodness, then there should not be any evil in the world. This problem is often referred to as "The Problem of Evil" and has been a long standing point of contention for theologians.

Spinoza and Hegel envisioned God, or the Absolute, pantheistically. If they are correct, then to call God infinite, is to call the world itself infinite. Hegel denigrated Aristotle’s advocacy of potential infinity and claimed the world is actually infinite. Traditional Christian, Muslim and Jewish metaphysicians do not accept the pantheistic notion that God is at one with the world. Instead they say God transcends the world. Since God is outside space and time, the space and time that he created may or may not be infinite, depending on God’s choice, but surely everything else he created is finite, they say.

The multiverse theories of cosmology in the early 21st century allow there to be an uncountable infinity of universes within a background space whose volume is actually infinite. The universe created by our Big Bang is just one of these many universes. Christian theologians balk at the notion of God choosing to create this multiverse because the theory implies that, although there are so many universes radically different from ours, there also are an actually infinite number of copies of ours, which implies there are an infinite number of Jesuses who have been crucified on the cross. The removal of the uniqueness of Jesus is apparently a removal of his dignity. Augustine had this worry when considering infinite universes, and he responded that "Christ died once for sinners...."

There are many other entities and properties that some metaphysician or other has claimed are infinite: places, possibilities, propositions, properties, particulars, partial orderings, pi’s decimal expansion, predicates, proofs, Plato’s forms, principles, power sets, probabilities, positions, and possible worlds. That is just for the letter p. Some of these are considered to be abstract objects, objects outside of space and time, and others are considered to be concrete objects, objects within, or part of, space and time.

For helpful surveys of the history of infinity in theology and metaphysics, see (Owen 1967) and (Moore 2001).

4. Infinity in Physical Science

From a metaphysical perspective, the theories of mathematical physics seem to be ontologically committed to objects and their properties. If any of those objects or properties are infinite, then physics is committed to there being infinity within the physical world.

Here are four suggested examples where infinity occurs within physical science. (1) Standard cosmology based on Einstein’s general theory of relativity implies the density of the mass at the center of a simple black hole is infinitely large (even though black hole’s total mass is finite). (2) The Standard Model of particle physics implies the size of an electron is infinitely small. (3) General relativity implies that every path in space is infinity divisible. (4) Classical quantum theory implies the values of kinetic energy of an accelerating, free electron are infinitely numerous. These four kinds of infinities—infinite large, infinitely small, infinitely divisible, and infinitely numerous—are implied by theory and argumentation, and are not something that could be measured directly.

Objecting to taking scientific theories at face value, the 18th century British empiricists George Berkeley and David Hume denied the physical reality of even potential infinities on the empiricist grounds that such infinities are not detectable by our sense organs. Most philosophers of the 21st century would say that Berkeley’s and Hume’s empirical standards are too rigid because they are based on the mistaken assumption that our knowledge of reality must be a complex built up from simple impressions gained from our sense organs.

But in the spirit of Berkeley and Hume’s empiricism, instrumentalists also challenge any claim that science tells us the truth about physical infinities. The instrumentalists say that all theories of science are merely effective “instruments” designed for explanatory and predictive success. A scientific theory’s claims are neither true nor false. By analogy, a shovel is an effective instrument for digging, but a shovel is neither true nor false. The instrumentalist would say our theories of mathematical physics imply only that reality looks “as if” there are physical infinities. Some realists on this issue respond that to declare it to be merely a useful mathematical fiction that there are physical infinities is just as misleading as to say it is a mere fiction that moving planets actually have inertia or petunias actually contain electrons. We have no other tool than theory-building for accessing the existing features of reality that are not directly perceptible. If our best theories—those that have been well tested and are empirically successful and make novel predictions—use theoretical terms that refer to infinities, then infinities must be accepted. See (Leplin 2000) for more details about anti-realist arguments, such as those of instrumentalism and constructive empiricism.

a. Infinitely Small and Infinitely Divisible

Consider the size of electrons and quarks, the two main components of atoms. All scientific experiments so far have been consistent with electrons and quarks having no internal structure (components), as our best scientific theories imply, so the "simple conclusion" is that electrons are infinitely small, or infinitesimal, and zero-dimensional. Is this “simple conclusion” too simple? Some physicists speculate that there are no physical particles this small and that, in each subsequent century, physicists will discover that all the particles of the previous century have a finite size due to some inner structure. However, most physicists withhold judgment on this point about the future of physics.

A second reason to question whether the “simple conclusion” is too simple is that electrons, quarks, and all other elementary particles behave in a quantum mechanical way. They have a wave nature as well as a particle nature, and they have these simultaneously. When probing an electron’s particle nature it is found to have no limit to how small it can be, but when probing the electron’s wave nature, the electron is found to be spread out through all of space, although it is more probably in some places than others. Also, quantum theory is about groups of objects, not a single object. The theory does not imply a definite result for a single observation but only for averages over many observations, so this is why quantum theory introduces an inescapable randomness or unpredictability into claims about single objects and single experimental results. The more accurate theory of quantum electrodynamics (QED) that incorporates special relativity and improves on classical quantum theory for the smallest regions, also implies electrons are infinitesimal particles when viewed as particles, while they are wavelike or spread out when viewed as waves. When considering the electron’s particle nature, QED’s prediction of zero volume has been experimentally verified down to the limits of measurement technology. The measurement process is limited by the fact that light or other electromagnetic radiation must be used to locate the electron, and this light cannot be used to determine the position of the electron more accurately than the distance between the wave crests of the light wave used to bombard the electron. So, all this is why the “simple conclusion” mentioned at the beginning of this paragraph may be too simple. For more discussion, see the chapter “The Uncertainty Principle” in (Hawking 2001) or (Greene 1999, pp. 121-2).

If a scientific theory implies space is a continuum, with the structure of a mathematical continuum, then if that theory is taken at face value, space is infinitely divisible and composed of infinitely small entities, the so-called points of space. But should it be taken at face value? The mathematician David Hilbert declared in 1925, “A homogeneous continuum which admits of the sort of divisibility needed to realize the infinitely small is nowhere to be found in reality. The infinite divisibility of a continuum is an operation which exists only in thought.” Many physicists agree with Hilbert, but many others argue that, although Hilbert is correct that ordinary entities such as strawberries and cream are not continuous, he is ultimately incorrect, for the following reasons.

First, the Standard Model of particles and forces is one of the best tested and most successful theories in all the history of physics. So are the theories of relativity and quantum mechanics. All these theories imply or assume that, using Cantor’s technical sense of actual infinity, there are infinitely many infinitesimal instants in any non-zero duration, and there are infinitely many point places along any spatial path. So, time is a continuum, and space is a continuum.

The second challenge to Hilbert’s position is that quantum theory, in agreement with relativity theory, implies that for any possible kinetic energy of a free electron there is half that energy−insofar as an electron can be said to have a value of energy independent of being measured to have it. Although the energy of an electron bound within an atom is quantized, the energy of an unbound or free electron is not. If it accelerates in its reference frame from zero to nearly the speed of light, its energy changes and takes on all intermediate real-numbered values from its rest energy to its total energy. But mass is just a form of energy, as Einstein showed in his famous equation E = mc2, so in this sense mass is a continuum as well as energy.

How about non-classical quantum mechanics, the proposed theories of quantum gravity that are designed to remove the disagreements between quantum mechanics and relativity theory? Do these non-classical theories quantize all these continua we’ve been talking about? One such theory, the theory of loop quantum gravity, implies space consists of discrete units called loops. But string theory, which is the more popular of the theories of quantum gravity in the early 21st century, does not imply space is discontinuous. [See (Greene 2004) for more details.] Speaking about this question of continuity, the theoretical physicist Brian Greene says that, although string theory is developed against a background of continuous spacetime, his own insight is that

[T]he increasingly intense quantum jitters that arise on decreasing scales suggest that the notion of being able to divide distances or durations into ever smaller units likely comes to an end at around the Planck length (10-33centimeters) and Planck time (10-43 seconds). ...There is something lurking in the microdepths−something that might be called the bare-bones substrate of spacetime−the entity to which the familiar notion of spacetime alludes. We expect that this ur-ingredient, this most elemental spacetime stuff, does not allow dissection into ever smaller pieces because of the violent fluctuations that would ultimately be encountered.... [If] familiar spacetime is but a large-scale manifestation of some more fundamental entity, what is that entity and what are its essential properties? As of today, no one knows. (Greene 2004, pp. 473, 474, 477)

Disagreeing, the theoretical physicist Roger Penrose speaks about both loop quantum gravity and string theory and says: the early days of quantum mechanics, there was a great hope, not realized by future developments, that quantum theory was leading physics to a picture of the world in which there is actually discreteness at the tiniest levels. In the successful theories of our present day, as things have turned out, we take spacetime as a continuum even when quantum concepts are involved, and ideas that involve small-scale spacetime discreteness must be regarded as ‘unconventional.’ The continuum still features in an essential way even in those theories which attempt to apply the ideas of quantum mechanics to the very structure of space and time.... Thus it appears, for the time being at least, that we need to take the use of the infinite seriously, particular in its role in the mathematical description of the physical continuum. (Penrose 2005, 363)

b. Singularities

There is a good reason why scientists fear the infinite more than mathematicians do. Scientists have to worry that someday we will have a dangerous encounter with a singularity, with something that is, say, infinitely hot or infinitely dense. For example, we might encounter a singularity by being sucked into a black hole. According to Schwarzschild’s solution to the equations of general relativity, a simple, non-rotating black hole is infinitely dense at its center. For a second example of where there may be singularities, there is good reason to believe that 13.8 billion years ago the entire universe was a singularity with infinite temperature, infinite density, infinitesimal volume, and infinite curvature of spacetime.

Some philosophers will ask: Is it not proper to appeal to our best physical theories in order to learn what is physically possible? Usually, but not in this case, say many scientists, including Albert Einstein. He believed that, if a theory implies that some physical properties might have or, worse yet, do have actually infinite values (the so-called singularities), then this is a sure sign of error in the theory. It’s an error primarily because the theory will be unable to predict the behavior of the infinite entity, and so the theory will fail. For example, even if there were a large, shrinking universe pre-existing the Big Bang, if the Big Bang were considered to be an actual singularity, then knowledge of the state of the universe before the Big Bang could not be used to predict events after the Big Bang, or vice versa. This failure to imply the character of later states of the universe is what Einstein’s collaborator Peter Bergmann meant when he said, “A theory that involves singularities...carries within itself the seeds of its own destruction.” The majority of physicists probably would agree with Einstein and Bergmann about this, but the critics of these scientists say this belief that we need to remove singularities everywhere is merely a hope that has been turned into a metaphysical assumption.

But doesn’t quantum theory also rule out singularities? Yes. Quantum theory allows only arbitrary large, finite values of properties such as temperature and mass-energy density. So which theory, relativity theory or quantum theory, should we trust to tell us whether the center of a black hole is or isn’t a singularity? The best answer is, “Neither, because we should get our answer from a theory of quantum gravity.” A principal attraction of string theory, a leading proposal for a theory of quantum gravity to replace both relativity theory and quantum theory, is that it eliminates the many singularities that appear in previously accepted physical theories such as relativity theory. In string theory, the electrons and quarks are not point particles but are small, finite loops of fundamental string. That finiteness in the loop is what eliminates the singularities.

Unfortunately, string theory has its own problems with infinity. It implies an infinity of kinds of particles. If a particle is a string, then the energy of the particle should be the energy of its vibrating string. Strings have an infinite number of possible vibrational patterns each corresponding to a particle that should exist if we take the theory literally. One response that string theorists make to this problem about too many particles is that perhaps the infinity of particles did exist at the time of the Big Bang but now they have all disintegrated into a shower of simpler particles and so do not exist today. Another response favored by string theorists is that perhaps there never were an infinity of particles nor a Big Bang singularity in the first place. Instead the Big Bang was a Big Bounce or quick expansion from a pre-existing, shrinking universe whose size stopped shrinking when it got below the critical Planck length of about 10-35 meters.

c. Idealization and Approximation

Scientific theories use idealization and approximation; they are "lies that help us to see the truth," to use a phrase from the painter Pablo Picasso (who was speaking about art, not science). In our scientific theories, there are ideal gases, perfectly elliptical orbits, and economic consumers motivated only by profit. Everybody knows these are not intended to be real objects. Yet, it is clear that idealizations and approximations are actually needed in science in order to promote genuine explanation of many phenomena. We need to reduce the noise of the details in order to see what is important. In short, approximations and idealizations can be explanatory. But what about approximations and idealizations that involve the infinite?

Although the terms “idealization” and “approximation” are often used interchangeably, John Norton (Norton 2012) recommends paying more attention to their difference by saying that, when there is some aspect of the world, some target system, that we are trying to understand scientifically, approximations should be considered to be inexact descriptions of the target system whereas idealizations should be considered to be new systems or parts of new systems that also are approximations to the target system but that contain reference to some novel object or property. For example, elliptical orbits are approximations to actual orbits of planets, but ideal gases are idealizations because they contain novel objects such as point-sized gas particles that are part of a new system that is useful for approximating the target system of actual gases.

Philosophers of science disagree about whether all appeals to infinity can be known a priori to be mere idealizations or approximations. Our theory of the solar system justifies our belief that the Earth is orbited by a moon, not just an approximate moon. The speed of light in a vacuum really is constant, not just approximately constant. Why then should it be assumed, as it often is, that all appeals to infinity in scientific theory are approximations or idealizations? Must the infinity be an artifact of the model rather than a feature of actual physical reality?  Philosophers of science disagree on this issue. See (Mundy, 1990, p. 290).

There is an argument for believing some appeals to infinity definitely are neither approximations nor idealizations. The argument presupposes a realist rather than an antirealist understanding of science, and it begins with a description of the opponents’ position. Carl Friedrich Gauss (1777-1855) was one of the greatest mathematicians of all time. He said scientific theories involve infinities merely as approximations or idealizations and merely in order to make for easy applications of those theories, when in fact all real entities are finite. At the time, nearly everyone would have agreed with Gauss. Roger Penrose argues against Gauss’ position:

Nevertheless, as tried and tested physical theory stands today—as it has for the past 24 centuries—real numbers still form a fundamental ingredient of our understanding of the physical world. (Penrose 2004, 62)

Gauss’ position could be buttressed if there were useful alternatives to our physical theories that do not use infinities. There actually are alternative mathematical theories of analysis that do not use real numbers and do not use infinite sets and do not require the line to be dense. See (Ahmavaara 1965) for an example. Representing the majority position among scientists on this issue, Penrose says, “To my mind, a physical theory which depends fundamentally upon some absurdly enormous...number would be a far more complicated (and improbable) theory than one that is able to depend upon a simple notion of infinity” (Penrose 2005, 359). David Deutsch agrees. He says, “Versions of number theory that confined themselves to ‘small natural numbers’ would have to be so full of arbitrary qualifiers, workarounds and unanswered questions, that they would be very bad explanations until they were generalized to the case that makes sense without such ad-hoc restrictions: the infinite case.” (Deutsch 2011, pp. 118-9) And surely a successful explanation is the surest route to understanding reality.

In opposition to this position of Penrose and Deutsch, and in support of Gauss’ position, the physicist Erwin Schrödinger remarks, “The idea of a continuous range, so familiar to mathematicians in our days, is something quite exorbitant, an enormous extrapolation of what is accessible to us.” Emphasizing this point about being “accessible to us,” some metaphysicians attack the applicability of the mathematical continuum to physical reality on the grounds that a continuous human perception over time is not mathematically continuous. Wesley Salmon responds to this complaint from Schrödinger:

...The perceptual continuum and perceived becoming [that is, the evidence from our sense organs that the world changes from time to time] exhibit a structure radically different from that of the mathematical continuum. Experience does seem, as James and Whitehead emphasize, to have an atomistic character. If physical change could be understood only in terms of the structure of the perceptual continuum, then the mathematical continuum would be incapable of providing an adequate description of physical processes. In particular, if we set the epistemological requirement that physical continuity must be constructed from physical points which are explicitly definable in terms of observables, then it will be impossible to endow the physical continuum with the properties of the mathematical continuum. In our discussion..., we shall see, however, that no such rigid requirement needs to be imposed. (Salmon 1970, 20)

Salmon continues by making the point that calculus provides better explanations of physical change than explanations which accept the “rigid requirement” of understanding physical change in terms of the structure of the perceptual continuum, so he recommends that we apply Ockham’s Razor and eliminate that rigid requirement. But the issue is not settled.

d. Infinity in Cosmology

Let’s review some of the history regarding the volume of spacetime. Aristotle said the past is infinite because, for any past time we can imagine an earlier one. It is difficult to make sense of his belief about the past since he means it is potentially infinite. After all, the past has an end, namely the present, so its infinity has been completed and therefore is not a potential infinity. This problem with Aristotle’s reasoning was first raised in the 13th century by Richard Rufus of Cornwall. It was not given the attention it deserved because of the assumption for so many centuries that Aristotle couldn’t have been wrong about time, especially since his position was consistent with Christian, Jewish, and Muslim theology which implies the physical world became coherent or well-formed only a finite time ago (even if past time itself is potentially infinite). However, Aquinas argued against Aristotle’s view that the past is infinite; Aquinas’ grounds were that Holy Scripture implies God created the world (and thus time itself) a finite time ago, and that Aristotle was wrong to put so much trust in what we can imagine.

Unlike time, Aristotle claimed space is finite. He said the volume of physical space is finite because it is enclosed within a finite, spherical shell of visible, fixed stars with the Earth at its center. On this topic of space not being infinite, Aristotle’s influence was authoritative to most scholars for the next eighteen hundred years.

The debate about whether the volume of space is infinite was rekindled in Renaissance Europe. The English astronomer and defender of Copernicus, Thomas Digges (1546–1595) was the first scientist to reject the ancient idea of an outer spherical shell and to declare that physical space is actually infinite in volume and filled with stars. The physicist Isaac Newton (1642–1727) at first believed the universe's material is confined to only a finite region while it is surrounded by infinite empty space, but in 1691 he realized that if there were a finite number of stars in a finite region, then gravity would require all the stars to fall in together at some central point. To avoid this result, he later speculated that the universe contains an infinite number of stars in an infinite volume. The notion of infinite time, however, was not accepted by Newton because of conflict with Christian orthodoxy, as influenced by Aquinas. We now know that Newton’s speculation about the stability of an infinity of stars in an infinite universe is incorrect. There would still be clumping so long as the universe did not expand. (Hawking 2001, p. 9)

Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) declared that space and time are both potentially infinite in extent because this is imposed by our own minds. Space and time are not features of “things in themselves” but are an aspect of the very form of any possible human experience, he said. We can know a priori even more about space than about time, he believed; and he declared that the geometry of space must be Euclidean. Kant’s approach to space and time as something knowable a priori went out of fashion in the early 20th century. It was undermined in large part by the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 19th century, then by Beltrami’s and Klein’s proofs that these geometries are as logically consistent as Euclidean geometry, and finally by Einstein’s successful application to physical space of non-Euclidean geometry within his general theory of relativity.

The volume of spacetime is finite at present if we can trust the classical Big Bang theory. [But do not think of this finite space as having a boundary beyond which a traveler falls over the edge into nothingness, or a boundary that cannot be penetrated.] Assuming space is all the places that have been created since the Big Bang, then the volume of space is definitely finite at present, though it is huge and growing ever larger over time. Assuming this expansion will never stop, it follows that the volume of spacetime is potentially infinite but not actually infinite. However, if, as some theorists speculate on the basis of inflationary cosmology, everything that is a product of our Big Bang is just one “bubble” in a sea of bubbles in the infinite spacetime background of the Multiverse, then both space and time are actually infinite. For more discussion of the issue of the infinite volume of spacetime, see (Greene 2011).

5. Infinity in Mathematics

The previous sections of this article have introduced the concepts of actual infinity and potential infinity and explored the development of calculus and set theory, but this section will probe deeper into the role of infinity in mathematics. Mathematicians always have been aware of the special difficulty in dealing with the concept of infinity in a coherent manner. Intuitively, it seems reasonable that if we have two infinities of things, then we still have an infinity of them. So, we might represent this intuition mathematically by the equation 2 ∞ = 1 ∞. Dividing both sides by ∞ will prove that 2 = 1, which is a good sign we were not using infinity in a coherent manner. In recommending how to use the concept of infinity coherently, Bertrand Russell said pejoratively:

The whole difficulty of the subject lies in the necessity of thinking in an unfamiliar way, and in realising that many properties which we have thought inherent in number are in fact peculiar to finite numbers. If this is remembered, the positive theory of infinity...will not be found so difficult as it is to those who cling obstinately to the prejudices instilled by the arithmetic which is learnt in childhood. (Salmon 1970, 58)

That positive theory of infinity that Russell is talking about is set theory, and the new arithmetic is the result of Cantor’s generalizing the notions of order and of size of sets into the infinite, that is, to the infinite ordinals and infinite cardinals. These numbers are also called transfinite ordinals and transfinite cardinals. The following sections will briefly explore set theory and the role of infinity within mathematics. The main idea, though, is that the basic theories of mathematical physics are properly expressed using the differential calculus with real-number variables, and these concepts are well-defined in terms of set theory which, in turn, requires using actual infinities or transfinite infinities of various kinds.

a. Infinite Sums

In the 17th century, when Newton and Leibniz invented calculus, they wondered what the value is of this infinite sum:

1/1 + 1/2 + 1/4 + 1/8 + ....

They believed the sum is 2. Knowing about the dangers of talking about infinity, most later mathematicians hoped to find a technique to avoid using the phrase “infinite sum.” Cauchy and Weierstrass eventually provided this technique two centuries later. They removed any mention of “infinite sum” by using the formal idea of a limit. Informally, the Cauchy-Weierstrass idea is that instead of overtly saying the infinite sum s1 + s2 + s3 + … is some number S, as Newton and Leibniz were saying, one should say that the sequence converges to S just in case the numerical difference between any pair of terms within the sequence is as small as one desires, provided the two terms are sufficiently far out in the sequence. More formally it is expressed this way: The series s1 + s2 + s3 + … converges to S if, and only if, for every positive number ε there exists a number δ such that |sn+h +  sn| < ε for all integers n > δ and all integers h > 0. In this way, reference to an actual infinity has been eliminated.

This epsilon-delta technique of talking about limits was due to Cauchy in 1821 and Weierstrass in the period from 1850 to 1871. The two drawbacks to this technique are that (1) it is unintuitive and more complicated than Newton and Leibniz’s intuitive approach that did mention infinite sums, and (2) it is not needed because infinite sums were eventually legitimized by being given a set-theoretic foundation.

b. Infinitesimals and Hyperreals

There has been considerable controversy throughout history about how to understand infinitesimal objects and infinitesimal changes in the properties of objects. Intuitively an infinitesimal object is as small as you please but not quite nothing. Infinitesimal objects and infinitesimal methods were first used by Archimedes in ancient Greece, but he did not mention them in any publication intended for the public because he did not consider his use of them to be rigorous. Infinitesimals became better known when Leibniz used them in his differential and integral calculus. The differential calculus can be considered to be a technique for treating continuous motion as being composed of an infinite number of infinitesimal steps. The calculus’ use of infinitesimals led to the so-called “golden age of nothing” in which infinitesimals were used freely in mathematics and science. During this period, Leibniz, Euler, and the Bernoullis applied the concept. Euler applied it cavalierly (although his intuition was so good that he rarely if ever made mistakes), but Leibniz and the Bernoullis were concerned with the general question of when we could, and when we could not, consider an infinitesimal to be zero. They were aware of apparent problems with these practices in large part because they had been exposed by Berkeley.

In 1734, George Berkeley attacked the concept of infinitesimal as ill-defined and incoherent because there were no definite rules for when the infinitesimal should be and shouldn’t be considered to be zero. Berkeley, like Leibniz, was thinking of infinitesimals as objects with a constant value--as genuinely infinitesimally small magnitudes--whereas Newton thought of them as variables that could arbitrarily approach zero. Either way, there were coherence problems. The scientists and results-oriented mathematicians of the golden age of nothing had no good answer to the coherence problem. As standards of rigorous reasoning increased over the centuries, mathematicians became more worried about infinitesimals. They were delighted when Cauchy in 1821 and Weierstrass in the period from 1850 to 1875 developed a way to use calculus without infinitesimals, and at this time any appeal to infinitesimals was considered illegitimate, and mathematicians soon stopped using infinitesimals.

Here is how Cauchy and Weierstrass eliminated infinitesimals with their concept of limit. Suppose we have a function f,  and we are interested in the Cartesian graph of the curve y = f(x) at some point a along the x axis. What is the rate of change of  f at a? This is the slope of the tangent line at a, and it is called the derivative f' at a. This derivative was defined by Leibniz to be


where h is an infinitesimal. Because of suspicions about infinitesimals, Cauchy and Weierstrass suggested replacing Leibniz’s definition of the derivative with


That is,  f'(a) is the limit, as x approaches a, of the above ratio. The limit idea was rigorously defined using Cauchy’s well known epsilon and delta method. Soon after the Cauchy-Weierstrass definition of derivative was formulated, mathematicians stopped using infinitesimals.

The scientists did not follow the lead of the mathematicians. Despite the lack of a coherent theory of infinitesimals, scientists continued to reason with infinitesimals because infinitesimal methods were so much more intuitively appealing than the mathematicians’ epsilon-delta methods. Although students in calculus classes in the early 21st century are still taught the unintuitive epsilon-delta methods, Abraham Robinson (Robinson 1966) created a rigorous alternative to standard Weierstrassian analysis by using the methods of model theory to define infinitesimals.

Here is Robinson’s idea. Think of the rational numbers in their natural order as being gappy with real numbers filling the gaps between them. Then think of the real numbers as being gappy with hyperreals filling the gaps between them. There is a cloud or region of hyperreals surrounding each real number (that is, surrounding each real number described nonstandardly). To develop these ideas more rigorously, Robinson used this simple definition of an infinitesimal:

h is infinitesimal if and only if 0 < |h| < 1/n, for every positive integer n.

|h| is the absolute value of h.

Robinson did not actually define an infinitesimal as a number on the real line. The infinitesimals were defined on a new number line, the hyperreal line, that contains within it the structure of the standard real numbers from classical analysis. In this sense the hyperreal line is the extension of the reals to the hyperreals. The development of analysis via infinitesimals creates a nonstandard analysis with a hyperreal line and a set of hyperreal numbers that include real numbers. In this nonstandard analysis, 78+2h is a hyperreal that is infinitesimally close to the real number 78. Sums and products of infinitesimals are infinitesimal.

Because of the rigor of the extension, all the arguments for and against Cantor’s infinities apply equally to the infinitesimals. Sentences about the standardly-described reals are true if and only if they are true in this extension to the hyperreals. Nonstandard analysis allows proofs of all the classical theorems of standard analysis, but it very often provides shorter, more direct, and more elegant proofs than those that were originally proved by using standard analysis with epsilons and deltas. Objections by practicing mathematicians to infinitesimals subsided after this was appreciated. With a good definition of “infinitesimal” they could then use it to explain related concepts such as in the sentence, “That curve approaches infinitesimally close to that line.” See (Wolf 2005, chapter 7) for more about infinitesimals and hyperreals.

c. Mathematical Existence

Mathematics is apparently about mathematical objects, so it is apparently about infinitely large objects, infinitely small objects, and infinitely many objects. Mathematicians who are doing mathematics and are not being careful about ontology too easily remark that there are infinite dimensional spaces, the continuum, continuous functions, an infinity of functions, and this or that infinite structure. Do these infinities really exist? The philosophical literature is filled with arguments pro and con and with fine points about senses of existence.

When axiomatizing geometry, Euclid said that between any two points one could choose to construct a line. Opposed to Euclid’s constructivist stance, many modern axiomatizers take a realist philosophical stance by declaring simply that there exists a line between any two points, so the line pre-exists any construction process. In mathematics, the constructivist will recognize the existence of a mathematical object only if there is at present an algorithm (that is, a step by step “mechanical” procedure operating on symbols that is finitely describable, that requires no ingenuity and that uses only finitely many steps) for constructing or finding such an object. Assertions require proofs. The constructivist believes that to justifiably assert the negation of a sentence S is to prove that the assumption of S leads to a contradiction. So, legitimate mathematical objects must be shown to be constructible in principle by some mental activity and cannot be assumed to pre-exist any such construction process nor to exist simply because their non-existence would be contradictory. A constructivist, unlike a realist, is a kind of conceptualist, one who believes that an unknowable mathematical object is impossible. Most constructivists complain that, although potential infinites can be constructed, actual infinities cannot be.

There are many different schools of constructivism. The first systematic one, and perhaps the most well known version and most radical version, is due to L.E.J. Brouwer. He is not a finitist,  but his intuitionist school demands that all legitimate mathematics be constructible from a basis of mental processes he called “intuitions.” These intuitions might be more accurately called “clear mental procedures.” If there were no minds capable of having these intuitions, then there would be no mathematical objects just as there would be no songs without ideas in the minds of composers. Numbers are human creations. The number pi is intuitionistically legitimate because we have an algorithm for computing all its decimal digits, but the following number g is not legitimate: The following number g is illegitimate. It is the number whose nth digit is either 0 or 1, and it is 1 if and only if there are n consecutive 7s in the decimal expansion of pi. No person yet knows how to construct the decimal digits of g. Brouwer argued that the actually infinite set of natural numbers cannot be constructed (using intuitions) and so does not exist. The best we can do is to have a rule for adding more members to a set. So, his concept of an acceptable infinity is closer to that of potential infinity than actual infinity. Hermann Weyl emphasizes the merely potential character of these infinities:

Brouwer made it clear, as I think beyond any doubt, that there is no evidence supporting the belief in the existential character of the totality of all natural numbers…. The sequence of numbers which grows beyond any stage already reached by passing to the next number, is a manifold of possibilities open towards infinity; it remains forever in the status of creation, but is not a closed realm of things existing in themselves. (Weyl is quoted in (Kleene 1967, p. 195))

It is not legitimate for platonic realists, said Brouwer, to bring all the sets into existence at once by declaring they are whatever objects satisfy all the axioms of set theory. Brouwer believed realists accept too many sets because they are too willing to accept sets merely by playing coherently with the finite symbols for them when sets instead should be tied to our experience. For Brouwer this experience is our experience of time. He believed we should arrive at our concept of the infinite by noticing that our experience of a duration can be divided into parts and then these parts can be further divided, and so. This infinity is a potential infinity, not an actual infinity. For the intuitionist, there is no determinate, mind-independent mathematical reality which provides the facts to make mathematical sentences true or false. This metaphysical position is reflected in the principles of logic that are acceptable to an intuitionist. For the intuitionist, the sentence “For all x, x has property F” is true only if we have already proved constructively that each x has property F. And it is false only if we have proved that some x does not have property F. Otherwise, it is neither true nor false. The intuitionist does not accept the principle of excluded middle: For any sentence S, either S or the negation of S. Outraged by this intuitionist position, David Hilbert famously responded by saying, “To take the law of the excluded middle away from the mathematician would be like denying the astronomer the telescope or the boxer the use of his fists.” (quoted from Kleene 1967, p. 197) For a presentation of intuitionism with philosophical emphasis, see (Posy 2005) and (Dummett 1977).

Finitists, even those who are not constructivists, also argue that the actually infinite set of natural numbers does not exist. They say there is a finite rule for generating each numeral from the previous one, but the rule does not produce an actual infinity of either numerals or numbers. The ultrafinitist considers the classical finitist to be too liberal because finite numbers such as 2100 and 21000 can never be accessed by a human mind in a reasonable amount of time. Only the numerals or symbols for those numbers can be coherently manipulated. One challenge to ultrafinitists is that they should explain where the cutoff point is between numbers that can be accessed and numbers that cannot be. Ultrafinitsts have risen to this challenge. The mathematician Harvey Friedman says:

I raised just this objection [about a cutoff] with the (extreme) ultrafinitist Yessenin-Volpin during a lecture of his. He asked me to be more specific. I then proceeded to start with 21 and asked him whether this is “real” or something to that effect. He virtually immediately said yes. Then I asked about 22, and he again said yes, but with a perceptible delay. Then 23, and yes, but with more delay. This continued for a couple of more times, till it was obvious how he was handling this objection. Sure, he was prepared to always answer yes, but he was going to take 2100 times as long to answer yes to 2100 than he would to answering 21. There is no way that I could get very far with this. (Elwes 2010, 317)

This battle among competing philosophies of mathematics will not be explored in depth in this article, but this section will offer a few more points about mathematical existence.

Hilbert argued that, “If the arbitrarily given axioms do not contradict one another, then they are true and the things defined by the axioms exist.” But (Chihara 2008, 141) points out that Hilbert seems to be confusing truth with truth in a model. If a set of axioms is consistent, and so is its corresponding axiomatic theory, then the theory defines a class of models, and each axiom is true in any such model, but it does not follow that the axioms are really true. To give a crude, nonmathematical example, consider this set of two axioms {All horses are blue, all cows are green.}. The formal theory using these axioms is consistent and has a model, but it does not follow that either axiom is really true.

Quine objected to Hilbert's criterion for existence as being too liberal. Quine’s argument for infinity in mathematics begins by noting that our fundamental scientific theories are our best tools for helping us understand reality and doing ontology. Mathematical theories which imply the existence of some actually infinite sets are indispensable to all these scientific theories, and their referring to these infinities cannot be paraphrased away. All this success is a good reason to believe in some actual infinite sets and to say the sentences of both the mathematical theories and the scientific theories are true or approximately true since their success would otherwise be a miracle. But, he continues, of course it is no miracle. See (Quine 1960 chapter 7).

Quine believed that infinite sets exist only if they are indispensable in successful applications of mathematics to science; but he believed science so far needs only the first three alephs: ℵ0 for the integers, ℵ1 for the set of point places in space, and ℵ2 for the number of possible lines in space (including lines that are not continuous). The rest of Cantor’s heaven of transfinite numbers is unreal, Quine said, and the mathematics of the extra transfinite numbers is merely “recreational mathematics.” But Quine showed intellectual flexibility by saying that if he were to be convinced more transfinite sets were needed in science, then he’d change his mind about which alephs are real. To briefly summarize Quine’s position, his indispensability argument treats mathematical entities on a par with all other theoretical entities in science and says mathematical statements can be (approximately) true. Quine points out that reference to mathematical entities is vital to science, and there is no way of separating out the evidence for the mathematics from the evidence for the science. This famous indispensability argument has been attacked in many ways. Critics charge, “Quite aside from the intrinsic logical defects of set theory as a deductive theory, this is disturbing because sets are so very different from physical objects as ordinarily conceived, and because the axioms of set theory are so very far removed from any kind of empirical support or empirical testability…. Not even set theory itself can tell us how the existence of a set (e.g. a power set) is empirically manifested.” (Mundy 1990, pp. 289-90). See (Parsons 1980) for more details about Quine’s and other philosophers’ arguments about existence of mathematical objects.

d. Zermelo-Fraenkel Set Theory

Cantor initially thought of a set as being a collection of objects that can be counted, but this notion eventually gave way to a set being a collection that has a clear membership condition. Over several decades, Cantor’s naive set theory evolved into ZF, Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory, and ZF was accepted by most mid-20th century mathematicians as the correct tool to use for deciding which mathematical objects exist. The acceptance was based on three reasons. (1) ZF is precise and rigorous. (2) ZF is useful for defining or representing other mathematical concepts and methods. Mathematics can be modeled in set theory; it can be given a basis in set theory. (3) No inconsistency has been uncovered despite heavy usage.

Notice that one of the three reasons is not that set theory provides a foundation to mathematics in the sense of justifying the doing of mathematics or in the sense of showing its sentences are certain or necessary. Instead, set theory provides a basis for theories only in the sense that it helps to organize them, to reveal their interrelationships, and to provide a means to precisely define their concepts. The first program for providing this basis began in the late 19th century. Peano had given an axiomatization of the natural numbers. It can be expressed in set theory using standard devices for treating natural numbers and relations and functions and so forth as being sets. (For example, zero is the empty set, and a relation is a set of ordered pairs.) Then came the arithmetization of analysis which involved using set theory to construct from the natural numbers all the negative numbers and the fractions and real numbers and complex numbers. Along with this, the principles of these numbers became sentences of set theory. In this way, the assumptions used in informal reasoning in arithmetic are explicitly stated in the formalism, and proofs in informal arithmetic can be rewritten as formal proofs so that no creativity is required for checking the correctness of the proofs. Once a mathematical theory is given a set theoretic basis in this manner, it follows that if we have any philosophical concerns about the higher level mathematical theory, those concerns will also be concerns about the lower level set theory in the basis.

In addition to Dedekind’s definition, there are other acceptable definitions of "infinite set" and "finite set" using set theory. One popular one is to define a finite set as a set onto which a one-to-one function maps the set of all natural numbers that are less than some natural number n. That finite set contains n elements. An infinite set is then defined as one that is not finite. Dedekind, himself, used another definition; he defined an infinite set as one that is not finite, but defined a finite set as any set in which there exists no one-to-one mapping of the set into a proper subset of itself. The philosopher C. S. Peirce suggested essentially the same approach as Dedekind at approximately the same time, but he received little notice from the professional community. For more discussion of the details, see (Wilder 1965, p. 66f, and Suppes 1960, p. 99n).

Set theory implies quite a bit about infinity. First, infinity in ZF has some very unsurprising features. If a set A is infinite and is the same size as set B, then B also is infinite. If A is infinite and is a subset of B, then B also is infinite. Using the axiom of choice, it follows that a set is infinite just in case for every natural number n, there is some subset whose size is n.

ZF’s axiom of infinity declares that there is at least one infinite set, a so-called inductive set containing zero and the successor of each of its members (such as {0, 1, 2, 3, …}). The power set axiom (which says every set has a power set, namely a set of all its subsets) then generates many more infinite sets of larger cardinality, a surprising result that Cantor first discovered in 1874.

In ZF, there is no set with maximum cardinality, nor a set of all sets, nor an infinitely descending sequence of sets x0, x1, x2, ... in which x1 is in x0, and x2 is in x1, and so forth. There is however, an infinitely ascending sequence of sets x0, x1, x2, ... in which x0 is in x1, and x1 is in x2, and so forth. In ZF, a set exists if it is implied by the axioms; there is no requirement that there be some property P such that the set is the extension of P. That is, there is no requirement that the set be defined as {x| P(x)} for some property P. One especially important feature of ZF is that for any condition or property, there is only one set of objects having that property, but it cannot be assumed that for any property, there is a set of all those objects that have that property. For example, it cannot be assumed that, for the property of being a set, there is a set of all objects having that property.

In ZF, all sets are pure. A set is pure if it is empty or its members are sets, and its members' members are sets, and so forth. In informal set theory, a set can contain cows and electrons and other non-sets.

In the early years of set theory, the terms "set" and "class" and “collection” were used interchangeably, but in von Neumann–Bernays–Gödel set theory (NBG or VBG) a set is defined to be a class that is an element of some other class. NBG is designed to have proper classes, classes that are not sets, even though they can have members which are sets. The intuitive idea is that a proper class is a collection that is too big to be a set. There can be a proper class of all sets, but neither a set of all sets nor a class of all classes. A nice feature of NBG is that a sentence in the language of ZFC is provable in NBG only if it is provable in ZFC.

Are philosophers justified in saying there is more to know about sets than is contained within ZF set theory? If V is the collection or class of all sets, do mathematicians have any access to V independently of the axioms? This is an open question that arose concerning the axiom of choice and the continuum hypothesis.

e. The Axiom of Choice and the Continuum Hypothesis

Consider whether to believe in the axiom of choice. The axiom of choice is the assertion that, given any collection of non-empty and non-overlapping sets, there exists a ‘choice set’ which is composed of one element chosen from each set in the collection. However, the axiom does not say how to do the choosing. For some sets there might not be a precise rule of choice. If the collection is infinite and its sets are not well-ordered in any way that has been specified, then there is in general no way to define the choice set. The axiom is implicitly used throughout the field of mathematics, and several important theorems cannot be proved without it. Mathematical Platonists tend to like the axiom, but those who want explicit definitions or constructions for sets do not like it. Nor do others who note that mathematics’ most unintuitive theorem, the Banach-Tarski Theorem, requires the axiom of choice. The dispute can get quite intense with advocates of the axiom of choice saying that their opponents are throwing out invaluable mathematics, while these opponents consider themselves to be removing tainted mathematics. See (Wagon 1985) for more on the Banach-Tarski Theorem; see (Wolf 2005, pp. 226-8) for more discussion of which theorems require the axiom.

A set is always smaller than its power set. How much bigger is the power set? Cantor’s controversial continuum hypothesis says that the cardinality of the power set of ℵ0 is ℵ1, the next larger cardinal number, and not some higher cardinal. The generalized continuum hypothesis is more general; it says that, given an infinite set of any cardinality, the cardinality of its power set is the next larger cardinal and not some even higher cardinal. Cantor believed the continuum hypothesis, but he was frustrated that he could not prove it. The philosophical issue is whether we should alter the axioms to enable the hypotheses to be proved.

If ZF is formalized as a first-order theory of deductive logic, then both Cantor’s generalized continuum hypothesis and the axiom of choice are consistent with the other principles of set theory but cannot be proved or disproved from them, assuming that ZF is not inconsistent. In this sense, both the continuum hypothesis and the axiom of choice are independent of ZF. Gödel in 1940 and Cohen in 1964 contributed to the proof of this independence result.

So, how do we decide whether to believe the axiom of choice and continuum hypothesis, and how do we decide whether to add them to the principles of ZF or any other set theory? Most mathematicians do believe the axiom of choice is true, but there is more uncertainty about the continuum hypothesis. The independence does not rule out our someday finding a convincing argument that the hypothesis is true or a convincing argument that it is false, but the argument will need more premises than just the principles of ZF. At this point the philosophers of mathematics divide into two camps. The realists, who think there is a unique universe of sets to be discovered, believe that if ZF does not fix the truth values of the continuum hypothesis and the axiom of choice, then this is a defect within ZF and we need to explore our intuitions about infinity in order to uncover a missing axiom or two for ZF that will settle the truth values. These persons prefer to think that there is a single system of mathematics to which set theory is providing a foundation, but they would prefer not simply to add the continuum hypothesis itself as an axiom because the hope is to make the axioms "readily believable," yet it is not clear enough that the axiom itself is readily believable. The second camp of philosophers of mathematics disagree and say the concept of infinite set is so vague that we simply do not have any intuitions that will or should settle the truth values. According to this second camp, there are set theories with and without axioms that fix the truth values of the axiom of choice and the continuum hypothesis, and set theory should no more be a unique theory of sets than Euclidean geometry should be the unique theory of geometry.

Believing that ZFC’s infinities are merely the above-surface part of the great iceberg of infinite sets, many set theorists are actively exploring new axioms that imply the existence of sets that could not be proved to exist within ZFC. So far there is no agreement among researchers about the acceptability of any of the new axioms. See (Wolf 2005, pp. 226-8) and (Rucker 1982, pp. 252-3) for more discussion of the search for these new axioms.

6. Infinity in Deductive Logic

The infinite appears in many interesting ways in formal deductive logic, and this section presents an introduction to a few of those ways. Among all the various kinds of formal deductive logics, first-order logic (the usual predicate logic) stands out as especially important, in part because of the accuracy and detail with which it can mirror mathematical deductions. First-order logic also stands out because it is the strongest logic that has a proof for every one of its logically true sentences, and that is compact in the sense that if an infinite set of its sentences is inconsistent, then so is some finite subset.

But just what is first-order logic? To answer this and other questions, it is helpful to introduce some technical terminology. Here is a chart of what is ahead:

First-order language First-order theory First-order formal system First-order logic
Definition Formal language with quantifiers over objects but not over sets of objects. A set of sentences expressed in a first-order language. First-order theory plus its method for building proofs. First-order language with its method for building proofs.

A first-order theory is a set of sentences expressed in a first-order language (which will be defined below). A first-order formal system is a first-order theory plus its deductive structure (method of building proofs). The term “first-order logic” is ambiguous. It can mean a first-order language with its deductive structure, or it can mean simply the academic subject or discipline that studies first-order languages and theories.

Classical first-order logic is distinguished by its satisfying certain classically-accepted assumptions: that it has only two truth values; in an interpretation or valuation [note: the terminology is not standardized] , every sentence gets exactly one of the two truth values; no well-formed formula (wff) can contain an infinite number of symbols; a valid deduction cannot be made from true sentences to a false one; deductions cannot be infinitely long; the domain of an interpretation cannot be empty but can have any infinite cardinality; an individual constant (name) must name something in the domain; and so forth.

A formal language specifies the language’s vocabulary symbols and its syntax, primarily what counts as being a term or name and what are its well-formed formulas (wffs). A first-order language is a formal language whose symbols are the quantifiers (∃), connectives (↔), constants (a), variables (x), predicates or relations (R), and perhaps functions (f) and equality (=). It has a denumerable list of variables. (A set is denumerable or countably infinite if it has size ℵ0.) A first-order language has a countably finite or countably infinite number of predicate symbols and function symbols, but not a zero number of both. First-order languages differ from each other only in their predicate symbols or function symbols or constants symbols or in having or not having the equality symbol. See (Wolf 2005, p. 23) for more details. Every wff in a first-order language must contain only finitely many symbols. There are denumerably many terms, formulas, and sentences. Because there are uncountably many real numbers, a theory of real numbers in a first-order language does not have enough names for all the real numbers.

To carry out proofs or deductions in a first-order language, the language needs to be given a deductive structure. There are several different ways to do this (via axioms, natural deduction, sequent calculus), but the ways all are independent of which first-order language is being used, and they all require specifying rules such as modus ponens for how to deduce wffs from finitely many previous wffs in the deduction.

To give some semantics or meaning to its symbols, the first-order language needs a definition of valuation and of truth in a valuation and of validity of an argument. In a propositional logic, the valuation assigns to each sentence letter a single truth value; in predicate logic each term is given a denotation, and each predicate is given a set of objects in the domain that satisfy the predicate. The valuation rules then determine the truth values of all the wffs. The valuation’s domain is a set containing all the objects that the terms might denote and that the variables range over. The domain may be of any finite or transfinite size, but the variables can range only over objects in this domain, not over sets of those objects.

Because a first-order language cannot successfully express sentences that generalize over sets (or properties or classes or relations) of the objects in the domain, it cannot, for example, adequately express Leibniz’s Law that, “If objects a and b are identical, then they have the same properties.” A second-order language can do this. A language is second-order if in addition to quantifiers on variables that range over objects in the domain it also has quantifiers (such as œthe universal quantifier ∀P) on a second kind of variable P that ranges over properties (or classes or relations) of these objects. Here is one way to express Leibniz’s Law in second-order logic:

(a = b) --> ∀P(Pa ↔ Pb)

P is called a predicate variable or property variable. Every valid deduction in first-order logic is also valid in second-order logic. A language is third-order if it has quantifiers on variables that range over properties of properties of objects (or over sets of sets of objects), and so forth. A language is called higher-order if it is at least second-order.

The definition of first-order theory given earlier in this section was that it is any set of wffs in a first-order language. A more ordinary definition adds that it is closed under deduction. This additional requirement implies that every deductive consequence of some sentences of the theory also is in the theory. Since the consequences are countably infinite, all ordinary first-order theories are countably infinite.

If the language isn’t explicitly mentioned for a first-order theory, then it is generally assumed that the language is the smallest first-order language that contains all the sentences of the theory. Valuations of the language in which all the sentences of the theory are true are said to be models of the theory.

If the theory is axiomatized, then in addition to the logical axioms there are proper axioms (also called non-logical axioms); these axioms are specific to the theory (and so usually do not hold in other first-order theories). For example, Peano’s axioms when expressed in a first-order language are proper axioms for the formal theory of arithmetic, but they aren't logical axioms or logical truths. See (Wolf, 2005, pp. 32-3) for specific proper axioms of Peano Arithmetic and for proofs of some of its important theorems.

Besides the above problem about Leibniz’s Law, there is a related problem about infinity that occurs when Peano Arithmetic is expressed as a first-order theory. Gödel’s First Incompleteness Theorem proves that there are some bizarre truths which are independent of first-order Peano Arithmetic (PA), and so cannot be deduced within PA. None of these truths so far are known to lie in mainstream mathematics. But they might. And there is another reason to worry about the limitations of PA. Because the set of sentences of PA is only countable, whereas there are uncountably many sets of numbers in informal arithmetic, it might be that PA is inadequate for expressing and proving some important theorems about sets of numbers. See (Wolf 2005, pp. 33-4, 225).

It seems that all the important theorems of arithmetic and the rest of mathematics can be expressed and proved in another first-order theory, Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory with the axiom of choice (ZFC). Unlike first-order Peano Arithmetic, ZFC needs only a very simple first-order language that surprisingly has no undefined predicate symbol, equality symbol, relation symbol, or function symbol, other than a single two-place binary relation symbol intended to represent set membership. The domain is intended to be composed only of sets but since mathematical objects can be defined to be sets, the domain contains these mathematical objects.

a. Finite and Infinite Axiomatizability

In the process of axiomatizing a theory, any sentence of the theory can be called an axiom. When axiomatizing a theory, there is no problem with having an infinite number of axioms so long as the set of axioms is decidable, that is, so long as there is a finitely long computation or mechanical procedure for deciding, for any sentence, whether it is an axiom.

Logicians are curious as to which formal theories can be finitely axiomatized in a given formal system and which can only be infinitely axiomatized. Group theory is finitely axiomatizable in classical first-order logic, but Peano Arithmetic and ZFC are not. Peano Arithmetic is not finitely axiomatizable because it requires an axiom scheme for induction. An axiom scheme is a countably infinite number of axioms of similar form, and an axiom scheme for induction would be an infinite number of axioms of the form (expressed here informally): “If property P of natural numbers holds for zero, and also holds for n+1 whenever it holds for natural number n, then P holds for all natural numbers.” There needs to be a separate axiom for every property P, but there is a countably infinite number of these properties expressible in a first-order language of elementary arithmetic.

Assuming ZF is consistent, ZFC is not finitely axiomatizable in first-order logic, as Richard Montague discovered. Nevertheless ZFC is a subset of von Neumann–Bernays–Gödel (NBG) set theory, and the latter is finitely axiomatizable, as Paul Bernays discovered. The first-order theory of Euclidean geometry is not finitely axiomatizable, and the second-order logic used in (Field 1980) to reconstruct mathematical physics without quantifying over numbers also is not finitely axiomatizable. See (Mendelson 1997) for more discussion of finite axiomatizability.

b. Infinitely Long Formulas

An infinitary logic is a logic that makes one of classical logic’s necessarily finite features be infinite. In the languages of classical first-order logic, every formula is required to be only finitely long, but an infinitary logic might relax this. The original, intuitive idea behind requiring finitely long sentences in classical logic was that logic should reflect the finitude of the human mind. But with increasing opposition to psychologism in logic, that is, to making logic somehow dependent on human psychology, researchers began to ignore the finitude restrictions. Löwenheim in about 1915 was perhaps the pioneer here. In 1957, Alfred Tarski and Dana Scott explored permitting the operations of conjunction and disjunction to link infinitely many formulas into an infinitely long formula. Tarski also suggested allowing formulas to have a sequence of quantifiers of any transfinite length. William Hanf proved in 1964 that, unlike classical logics, these infinitary logics fail to be compact. See (Barwise 1975) for more discussion of these developments.

c. Infinitely Long Proofs

Classical formal logic requires proofs to contain a finite number of steps. In the mid-20th century with the disappearance of psychologism in logic, researchers began to investigate logics with infinitely long proofs as an aid to simplifying consistency proofs. See (Barwise 1975).

d. Infinitely Many Truth Values

One reason for permitting an infinite number of truth values is to represent the idea that truth is a matter of degree. The intuitive idea is that, say, depending on the temperature, the truth of “This cup of coffee is warm” might be definitely true, less true, even less true, and so forth.

One of the simplest infinite-valued semantics uses a continuum of truth values. Its valuations assign to each basic sentence (a formal sentence that contains no connectives or quantifiers) a truth value that is a specific number in the closed interval of real numbers from 0 to 1. The truth value of the vague sentence “This water is warm” is understood to be definitely true if it has the truth value 1 and definitely false if it has the truth value 0. To sentences having main connectives, the valuation assigns to the negation ~P of any sentence P the truth value of one minus the truth value assigned to P. It assigns to the conjunction P & Q the minimum of the truth values of P and of Q. It assigns to the disjunction P v Q the maximum of the truth values of P and of Q, and so forth.

One advantage to using an infinite-valued semantics is that by permitting modus ponens to produce a conclusion that is slightly less true than either premise, we can create a solution to the paradox of the heap, the sorites paradox. One disadvantage is that there is no well-motivated choice for the specific real number that is the truth value of a vague statement. What is the truth value appropriate to “This water is warm” when the temperature is 100 degrees Fahrenheit and you are interested in cooking pasta in it? Is the truth value 0.635? This latter problem of assigning truth values to specific sentences without being arbitrary has led to the development of fuzzy logics in place of the simpler infinite-valued semantics we have been considering. Lofti Zadeh suggested that instead of vague sentences having any of a continuum of precise truth values we should make the continuum of truth values themselves imprecise. His suggestion was to assign a sentence a truth value that is a fuzzy set of numerical values, a set for which membership is a matter of degree. For more details, see (Nolt 1997, pp. 420-7).

e. Infinite Models

A countable language is a language with countably many symbols. The Löwenhim Skolem Theorem says:

If a first-order theory in a countable language has an infinite model, then it has a countably infinite model.

This is a surprising result about infinity. Would you want your theory of real numbers to have a countable model? Strictly speaking it is a puzzle and not a paradox because the property of being countably infinite is a property it has when viewed from outside the object language not within it. The theorem does not imply first-order theories of real numbers must have no more real numbers than there are natural numbers.

The Löwenhim-Skolem Theorem can be extended to say that if a theory in a countable language has a model of some infinite size, then it also has models of any infinite size. This is a limitation on first-order theories; they do not permit having a categorical theory of an infinite structure.  A formal theory is said to be categorical if any two models satisfying the theory are isomorphic. The two models are isomorphic if they have the same structure; and they can’t be isomorphic if they have different sizes. So, if you create a first-order theory intended to describe a single infinite structure of a certain size, the theory will end up having, for any infinite size, a model of that size. This frustrates the hopes of anyone who would like to have a first-order theory of arithmetic that has models only of size ℵ0, and to have a first-order theory of real numbers that has models only of size 20.  See (Enderton 1972, pp. 142-3) for more discussion of this limitation.

Because of this limitation, many logicians have turned to second-order logics. There are second-order categorical theories for the natural numbers and for the real numbers. Unfortunately, there is no sound and complete deductive structure for any second-order logic having a decidable set of axioms; this is a major negative feature of second-order logics.

To illustrate one more surprise regarding infinity in formal logic, notice that the quantifiers are defined in terms of their domain, the domain of discourse. In a first-order set theory, the expression ∃xPx says there exists some set x in the infinite domain of all the sets such that x has property P. Unfortunately, in ZF there is no set of all sets to serve as this domain. So, it is oddly unclear what the expression ∃xPx means when we intend to use it to speak about sets.

f. Infinity and Truth

According to Alfred Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem, in an arbitrary first-order language a global truth predicate is not definable. A global truth predicate is a predicate which is satisfied by all and only the names (via, say, Gödel numbering) of all the true sentences of the formal language. According to Tarski, since no single language has a global truth predicate, the best approach to expressing truth formally within the language is to expand the  language into an infinite hierarchy of languages, with each higher language (the metalanguage) containing a truth predicate that can apply to all and only the true sentences of languages lower in the hierarchy. This process is iterated into the transfinite to obtain Tarski's hierarchy of metalanguages. Some philosophers have suggested that this infinite hierarchy is implicit within natural languages such as English, but other philosophers, including Tarski himself, believe an informal language does not contain within it a formal language.

To handle the concept of truth formally, Saul Kripke rejects the infinite hierarchy of metalanguages in favor of an infinite hierarchy of interpretations (that is, valuations) of a single language, such as a first-order predicate calculus, with enough apparatus to discuss its own syntax. The language’s intended truth predicate T is the only basic (atomic) predicate that is ever partially-interpreted at any stage of the hierarchy. At the first step in the hierarchy, all predicates but the single predicate T(x) are interpreted. T(x) is completely uninterpreted at this level. As we go up the hierarchy, the interpretation of the other basic predicates are unchanged, but T is satisfied by the names of sentences that were true at lower levels. For example, at the second level, T is satisfied by the name of the sentence ∀œx(Fx v ~Fx). At each step in the hierarchy, more sentences get truth values, but any sentence that has a truth value at one level has that same truth value at all higher levels. T almost becomes a global truth predicate when the inductive interpretation-building reaches the first so-called fixed point level. At this countably infinite level, although T is a truth predicate for all those sentences having one of the two classical truth values, the predicate is not quite satisfied by the names of every true sentence because it is not satisfied by the names of some of the true sentences containing T. At this fixed point level, the Liar sentence (of the Liar Paradox) is still neither true nor false. For this reason, the Liar sentence is said to fall into a “truth gap” in Kripke’s theory of truth. See (Kripke, 1975).

(Yablo 1993) produced a semantic paradox somewhat like the Liar Paradox. Yablo claimed there is no way to coherently assign a truth value to any of the sentences in the countably infinite sequence of sentences of the form, “None of the subsequent sentences are true.” Ask yourself whether the first sentence in the sequence could be true. Notice that no sentence overtly refers to itself. There is controversy in the literature about whether the paradox actually contains a hidden appeal to self-reference, and there has been some investigation of the parallel paradox in which “true” is replaced by “provable.” See (Beall 2001).

7. Conclusion

There are many aspects of the infinite that this article does not cover. Here are some of them: renormalization in quantum field theory, supertasks and infinity machines, categorematic and syncategorematic uses of the word “infinity,” mereology, ordinal and cardinal arithmetic in ZF, the various non-ZF set theories, non-standard solutions to Zeno's Paradoxes, Cantor's arguments for the Absolute, Kant’s views on the infinite, quantifiers that assert the existence of uncountably many objects, and the detailed arguments for and against constructivism, intuitionism, and finitism. For more discussion of these latter three programs, see (Maddy 1992).

8. References and Further Reading

  • Ahmavaara, Y. (1965). “The Structure of Space and the Formalism of Relativistic Quantum Theory,” Journal of Mathematical Physics, 6, 87-93.
    • Uses finite arithmetic in mathematical physics, and argues that this is the correct arithmetic for science.
  • Barrow, John D. (2005). The Infinite Book: A Short Guide to the Boundless, Timeless and Endless. Pantheon Books, New York.
    • An informal and easy-to-understand survey of the infinite in philosophy, theology, science and mathematics. Says which Western philosopher throughout the centuries said what about infinity.
  • Barwise, Jon. (1975) “Infinitary Logics,” in Modern Logic: A Survey, E. Agazzi (ed.), Reidel, Dordrecht, pp. 93-112.
    • An introduction to infinitary logics that emphasizes historical development.
  • Beall, J.C. (2001). “Is Yablo’s Paradox Non-Circular?” Analysis 61, no. 3, pp. 176-87.
    • Discusses the controversy over whether the Yablo Paradox is or isn’t indirectly circular.
  • Cantor, Georg. (1887). "Über die verschiedenen Ansichten in Bezug auf die actualunendlichen Zahlen." Bihang till Kongl. Svenska Vetenskaps-Akademien Handlingar , Bd. 11 (1886-7), article 19. P. A. Norstedt & Sôner: Stockholm.
    • A very early description of set theory and its relationship to old ideas about infinity.
  • Chihara, Charles. (1973). Ontology and the Vicious-Circle Principle. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
    • Pages 63-65 give Chihara’s reasons for why the Gödel-Cohen independence results are evidence against mathematical Platonism.
  • Chihara, Charles. (2008). “The Existence of Mathematical Objects,” in Proof & Other Dilemmas: Mathematics and Philosophy, Bonnie Gold & Roger A. Simons, eds., The Mathematical Association of America.
    • In chapter 7, Chihara provides a fine survey of the ontological issues in mathematics.
  • Deutsch, David. (2011). The Beginning of Infinity: Explanations that Transform the World. Penguin Books, New York City.
    • Emphasizes the importance of successful explanation in understanding the world, and provides new ideas on the nature and evolution of our knowledge.
  • Descartes, René. (1641). Meditations on First Philosophy.
    • The third meditation says, “But these properties [of God] are so great and excellent, that the more attentively I consider them the less I feel persuaded that the idea I have of them owes its origin to myself alone. And thus it is absolutely necessary to conclude, from all that I have before said, that God exists….”
  • Dummett, Michael. (1977). Elements of Intuitionism. Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • A philosophically rich presentation of intuitionism in logic and mathematics.
  • Elwes, Richard. (2010). Mathematics 1001: Absolutely Everything That Matters About Mathematics in 1001 Bite-Sized Explanations, Firefly Books, Richmond Hill, Ontario.
    • Contains the quoted debate between Harvey Friedman and a leading ultrafinitist.
  • Enderton, Herbert B. (1972). A Mathematical Introduction to Logic. Academic Press: New York.
    • An introduction to deductive logic that presupposes the mathematical sophistication of an advanced undergraduate mathematics major. The corollary proved on p. 142 says that if a theory in a countable language has a model of some infinite size, then it also has models of any infinite size.
  • Feferman, Anita Burdman, and Solomon. (2004) Alfred Tarski: Life and Logic, Cambridge University Press, New York.
    • A biography of Alfred Tarski, the 20th century Polish and American logician.
  • Field, Hartry. (1980). Science Without Numbers: A Defense of Nominalism. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • Field’s program is to oppose the Quine-Putnam Indispensability argument which apparently implies that mathematical physics requires the existence of mathematical objects such as numbers and sets. Field tries to reformulate scientific theories so, when they are formalized in second-order logic, their quantifiers do not range over abstract mathematical entities. Field’s theory uses quantifiers that range over spacetime points. However, because it uses a second order logic, the theory is also committed to quantifiers that range over sets of spacetime points, and sets are normally considered to be mathematical objects.
  • Gödel, Kurt. (1947/1983). “What is Cantor’s Continuum Problem?” American Mathematical Monthly 54, 515-525. Revised and reprinted in Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Readings, Paul Benacerraf and Hilary Putnam (eds.), Prentice-Hall, Inc. Englewood Cliffs, 1964.
    • Gödel argues that the failure of ZF to provide a truth value for Cantor’s continuum hypothesis implies a failure of ZF to correctly describe the Platonic world of sets.
  • Greene, Brian. (2004). The Fabric of Reality. Random House, Inc., New York.
    • Promotes the virtues of string theory.
  • Greene, Brian (1999). The Elegant Universe. Vintage Books, New York.
    • The quantum field theory called quantum electrodynamics (QED) is discussed on pp. 121-2.
  • Greene, Brian. (2011). The Hidden Reality: Parallel Universes and the Deep Laws of the Cosmos. Vintage Books, New York.
    • A popular survey of cosmology with an emphasis on string theory.
  • Hawking, Stephen. (2001). The Illustrated A Brief History of Time: Updated and Expanded Edition. Bantam Dell. New York.
    • Chapter 4 of Brief History contains an elementary and non-mathematical introduction to quantum mechanics and Heisenberg’s uncertainty principle.
  • Hilbert, David. (1925). “On the Infinite,” in Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Readings, Paul Benacerraf and Hilary Putnam (eds.), Prentice-Hall, Inc. Englewood Cliffs, 1964. 134-151.
    • Hilbert promotes what is now called the Hilbert Program for solving the problem of the infinite by requiring a finite basis for all acceptable assertions about the infinite.
  • Kleene, (1967). Mathematical Logic. John Wiley & Sons: New York.
    • An advanced textbook in mathematical logic.
  • Kripke, Saul. (1975). "Outline of a Theory of Truth," Journal of Philosophy 72, pp. 690–716.
    • Describes how to create a truth predicate within a formal language that avoids assigning a truth value to the Liar Sentence.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried. (1702). "Letter to Varignon, with a note on the 'Justification of the Infinitesimal Calculus by that of Ordinary Algebra,'" pp. 542-6. In Leibniz Philosophical Papers and Letters. translated by Leroy E. Loemkr (ed.). D. Reidel Publishing Company, Dordrecht, 1969.
    • Leibniz defends the actual infinite in calculus.
  • Levinas, Emmanuel. (1961). Totalité et Infini. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
    • In Totality and Infinity, the Continental philosopher Levinas describes infinity in terms of the possibilities a person confronts upon encountering other conscious beings.
  • Maddy, Penelope. (1992). Realism in Mathematics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A discussion of the varieties of realism in mathematics and the defenses that have been, and could be, offered for them. The book is an extended argument for realism about mathematical objects. She offers a set theoretic monism in which all physical objects are sets.
  • Maor, E. (1991). To Infinity and Beyond: A Cultural History of the Infinite. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • A survey of many of the issues discussed in this encyclopedia article.
  • Mendelson, Elliolt. (1997). An Introduction to Mathematical Logic, 4th ed. London: Chapman & Hall.
    • Pp. 225–86 discuss NBG set theory.
  • Mill, John Stuart. (1843). A System of Logic: Ratiocinative and Inductive. Reprinted in J. M. Robson, ed., Collected Works, volumes 7 and 8. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1973.
    • Mill argues for empiricism and against accepting the references of theoretical terms in scientific theories if the terms can be justified only by the explanatory success of those theories.
  • Moore, A. W. (2001). The Infinite. Second edition, Routledge, New York.
    • A popular survey of the infinite in metaphysics, mathematics, and science.
  • Mundy, Brent. (1990). “Mathematical Physics and Elementary Logic,” Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association. Vol. 1990, Volume 1. Contributed Papers (1990), pp. 289-301.
    • Discusses the relationships among set theory, logic and physics.
  • Nolt, John. Logics. (1997). Wadsworth Publishing Company, Belmont, California.
    • An undergraduate logic textbook containing in later chapters a brief introduction to non-standard logics such as those with infinite-valued semantics.
  • Norton, John. (2012). "Approximation and Idealization: Why the Difference Matters," Philosophy of Science, 79, pp. 207-232.
    • Recommends being careful about the distinction between approximation and idealization in science.
  • Owen, H. P. (1967). “Infinity in Theology and Metaphysics.” In Paul Edwards (Ed.) The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, volume 4, pp. 190-3.
    • This survey of the topic is still reliable.
  • Parsons, Charles. (1980). “Quine on the Philosophy of Mathematics.” In L. Hahn and P. Schilpp (Eds.) The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, pp. 396-403. La Salle IL: Open Court.
    • Argues against Quine’s position that whether a mathematical entity exists depends on the indispensability of the mathematical term denoting that entity in a true scientific theory.
  • Penrose, Roger. (2005). The Road to Reality: A Complete Guide to the Laws of the Universe. New York: Alfred A. Knopf.
    • A fascinating book about the relationship between mathematics and physics. Many of its chapters assume sophistication in advanced mathematics.
  • Posy, Carl. (2005). “Intuitionism and Philosophy.” In Stewart Shapiro. Ed. (2005). The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • The history of the intuitionism of Brouwer, Heyting and Dummett. Pages 330-1 explain how Brouwer uses choice sequences to develop “even the infinity needed to produce a continuum” non-empirically.
  • Quine, W. V. (1960). Word and Object. Cambridge: MIT Press.
    • Chapter 7 introduces Quine’s viewpoint that set theoretic objects exist because they are needed in the basis of our best scientific theories.
  • Quine, W. V. (1986). The Philosophy of W. V. Quine. Editors: Lewis Edwin Hahn and Paul Arthur Schilpp, Open Court, LaSalle, Illinois.
    • Contains the quotation saying infinite sets exist only insofar as they are needed for scientific theory.
  • Robinson, Abraham. (1966). Non-Standard Analysis. Princeton Univ. Press, Princeton.
    • Robinson’s original theory of the infinitesimal and its use in real analysis to replace the Cauchy-Weierstrass methods that use epsilons and deltas.
  • Rucker, Rudy. (1982). Infinity and the Mind: The Science and Philosophy of the Infinite. Birkhäuser: Boston.
    • A survey of set theory with much speculation about its metaphysical implications.
  • Russell, Bertrand. (1914). Our Knowledge of the External World as a Field for Scientific Method in Philosophy. Open Court Publishing Co.: Chicago.
    • Russell champions the use of contemporary real analysis and physics in resolving Zeno’s paradoxes. Chapter 6 is “The Problem of Infinity Considered Historically,” and that chapter is reproduced in (Salmon, 1970).
  • Salmon, Wesley, ed. (1970). Zeno's Paradoxes. The Bobbs-Merrill Company, Inc., Indianapolis.
    • A collection of the important articles on Zeno's Paradoxes plus a helpful and easy-to-read preface providing an overview of the issues.
  • Smullyan, Raymond. (1967). “Continuum Problem,” in Paul Edwards (ed.), The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Macmillan Publishing Co. & The Free Press: New York.
    • Discusses the variety of philosophical reactions to the discovery of the independence of the continuum hypotheses from ZF set theory.
  • Suppes, Patrick. (1960). Axiomatic Set Theory. D. Van Nostrand Company, Inc.: Princeton.
    • An undergraduate-level introduction to set theory.
  • Tarski, Alfred. (1924). “Sur les Ensembles Finis,” Fundamenta Mathematicae, Vol. 6, pp. 45-95.
    • Surveys and evaluates alternative definitions of finitude and infinitude proposed by Zermelo, Russell, Sierpinski, Kuratowski, Tarski, and others.
  • Wagon, Stan. (1985). The Banach-Tarski Paradox. Cambridge University Press: Cambridge.
    • The unintuitive Banach-Tarski Theorem says a solid sphere can be decomposed into a finite number of parts and then reassembled into two solid spheres of the same radius as the original sphere. Unfortunately you cannot double your sphere of solid gold this way.
  • Wilder, Raymond L. (1965) Introduction to the Foundations of Mathematics, 2nd ed., John Wiley & Sons, Inc.: New York.
    • An undergraduate-level introduction to the foundation of mathematics.
  • Wolf, Robert S. (2005). A Tour through Mathematical Logic. The Mathematical Association of America: Washington, D.C.
    • Chapters 2 and 6 describe set theory and its historical development. Both the history of the infinitesimal and the development of Robinson’s nonstandard model of analysis are described clearly on pages 280-316.
  • Yablo, Stephen. (1993). “Paradox without Self-Reference.” Analysis 53: 251-52.
    • Yablo presents a Liar-like paradox involving an infinite sequence of sentences that, the author claims, is “not in any way circular,” unlike with the traditional Liar Paradox.


Author Information

Bradley Dowden
California State University Sacramento
U. S. A.

Bernard Mandeville (1670—1733)

MandevilleBernard Mandeville is primarily remembered for his impact on discussions of morality and economic theory in the early eighteenth century. His most noteworthy and notorious work is The Fable of the Bees, which triggered immense public criticism at the time. He had a particular influence on philosophers of the Scottish Enlightenment, most notably Francis Hutcheson, David Hume, Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and Adam Smith. The Fable’s overall influence on the fields of ethics and economics is, perhaps, one of the greatest and most provocative of all early-eighteenth century English works.

The controversy sparked by the Fable was over Mandeville’s proposal that vices, such as vanity and greed, result in publically beneficial results. Along the same lines, he proposed that many of the actions commonly thought to be virtuous were, instead, self-interested at their core and therefore vicious. He was a critic of moral systems that claimed humans had natural feelings of benevolence toward one another, and he instead focused attention on self-interested passions like pride and vanity that led to apparent acts of benevolence. This caused his readers to imagine him to be a cruder reincarnation of Thomas Hobbes, particularly as a proponent of egoism. What follows is an overview of Mandeville’s life and influence, paying specific attention to his impact on discussions of morality and economic theory.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Fable of the Bees
  3. The Private Vice, Public Benefit Paradox
  4. The Egoist “Culprit”
  5. On Charity
  6. Influence on Economic Theory
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Mandeville
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Life

Mandeville was born in 1670 to a distinguished family in the Netherlands, either in or nearby Rotterdam. His father was a physician, as was his great-grandfather, a factor that, no doubt, influenced his own educational path in medicine at the University of Leyden, receiving his M.D. in 1691. He also held a baccalaureate in philosophy, and wrote his dissertation defending the Cartesian doctrine that animal bodies are mere automata because they lack immaterial souls.

Mandeville moved to England some time after the Glorious Revolution of 1688, and it was here he settled permanently, married, and had at least two children. His first published works in English were anonymous pieces in 1703 entitled The Pamphleteers: A Satyr and Some Fables after the Easie and Familiar Method of Monsieur de la Fontaine. In the first, Mandeville defends against those “pamphleteers” who were criticizing both the Glorious Revolution and the late King William III. In Some Fables, he translated twenty-seven of La Fontaine’s Fables, adding two of his own in the same comic style as employed in his later Grumbling Hive.

Although Dr. Mandeville supported his family through his work as a physician, he was also engaged in many literary-political activities. His political interests were not directly obvious until 1714 when he published a piece of political propaganda, The Mischiefs that Ought Justly to be Apprehended from a Whig-Government, which demonstrates his support for the Whig party. Throughout his life, he published numerous smaller works and essays, most of them containing harsh social criticism. Published in 1720, Free Thoughts on Religion, the Church and National Happiness was his final party political tract in which he endorses the advantages of Whig governance as well as advancing a skeptical view of the religious establishment and priestcraft.

Mandeville still continued to publish other provocative pieces, for example: A Modest Defence of Publick Stews (1724), containing controversial plans which would create public housing for prostitution. Within this piece he argued that the best societal solution was to legalize prostitution and regulate it under strict government supervision. Mandeville’s most notable and notorious work, however, was The Fable of the Bees; it began as an anonymous pamphlet of doggerel verse in 1705, entitled The Grumbling Hive: Or, Knaves Turn’d Honest. More is known of Mandeville’s writings than of his life, and so it is most useful to turn to The Fable for a further examination of his history.

2. The Fable of the Bees

It is rare that a poem finds its way into serious philosophical discussion, as The Grumbling Hive: or, Knaves Turn’d Honest has done. Written in the style of his previous fables, the 433-line poem served as the foundation for Mandeville’s principal work: The Fable of the Bees: or, Private Vices, Publick Benefits. The Fable grew over a period of twenty-four years, eventually reaching its final, sixth edition in 1729. In this work, Mandeville gives his analysis of how private vices result in public benefits like industry, employment and economic flourishing. Interpreted by his contemporaries as actively promoting vice as the singular explanation and precondition for a thriving economic society, this central analysis was the primary reason for Mandeville’s reputation as a scandalous libertine. This was a misreading of Mandeville’s position. Most of the work he later produced was either an expansion or defense of the Fable in the light of contemporary opposition.

The Grumbling Hive poem is a short piece, later published as just a section of the larger Fable, which was mostly comprised as a series of commentaries upon the 1705 poem. It immediately introduces its reader to a spacious and luxurious hive of bees. This hive was full of vice, “Yet the whole mass a paradise” (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 31). The society flourished in many ways, but no trade was without dishonesty. Oddly, the worst cheats of the hive were those who complained most about this dishonesty and fraud so plaguing their society. Here the poem dramatically turns as “all the rogues cry’d brazenly, Good gods, had we but honesty!” (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 33) Jove, the bees’ god, angrily rid the hive of all vice, but the results were catastrophic as the newly virtuous bees were no longer driven to compete with one another. As a result, industry collapsed, and the once flourishing society was destroyed in battle, leaving few bees remaining. These bees, to avoid the vices of ease and extravagance, flew into a hollow tree in a contented honesty.

The implication of the poem is clear for the beehive, but perhaps not for humanity: it seems paradoxical to suggest that a society is better when it promotes a culture characterized by private vice. However, it is precisely this paradox on which Mandeville draws to make his larger point. The “Moral” at the end of the poem claims, “Fools only strive To make a Great an’ honest Hive.”(The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 36) Mandeville thought the discontent over moral corruptness, or the private vice of society, was either hypocritical or incoherent, as such vice served an indispensable role in the economy by stimulating trade, industry and upward economic improvement i.e., public benefit. The desire to create a purely virtuous society was based on “a vain EUTOPIA seated in the Brain”: fancying that a nation can, with virtues like honesty, attain great wealth and success, when in fact it is the desire to improve one’s material condition in acts of self-indulgence that lies at the heart of economic productivity (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 36).

The poem’s humorous ending demonstrates that vice can look surprisingly like virtue if implemented correctly. To Mandeville’s readers this was a deeply offensive conclusion to draw, and yet for almost twenty years his work went largely unnoticed. In 1714, Mandeville published the Fable of the Bees, presented as a series of “Remarks” offering an extended commentary upon the original “The Grumbling Hive”, and intended to explain and elucidate the meaning of the earlier poem. But the Fable initially garnered little attention. It was not until a second edition in 1723, featuring a new addition, “An Essay on Charity and Charity-Schools”, that Mandeville gained the notoriety that would make him infamous amongst his contemporaries. The 1723 edition soon prompted reproach from the public, and was even presented before the Grand Jury of Middlesex and there declared a public nuisance. The presentment of the Jury claimed that the Fable intended to disparage religion and virtue as detrimental to society, and to promote vice as a necessary component of a well-functioning state. Though never censored, the book and author achieved sudden disrepute, and the Fable found itself the subject of conversation amongst clergymen, journalists, and philosophers.

3. The Private Vice, Public Benefit Paradox

Rather than giving a lengthy argument proving that private vice can be useful, Mandeville illustrates in the Fable that vice can be disguised, and yet is necessary in the attainment of collective goods, thus resulting in a paradox of “private vices, public benefits”. For instance, and to take one of Mandeville’s central examples, pride is a vice, and yet without pride there would be no fashion industry, as individuals would lack the motivation to buy new and expensive clothes with which to try and impress their peers. If pride were eradicated tomorrow, the result would leave hundreds of companies bankrupt, prompt mass unemployment, risk the collapse of industry, and in turn devastate both the economic security and with it the military power of the British commercial state. Similarly, and on a smaller scale, without thieves there would be no locksmiths, without quarrels over property, no lawyers, and so on.

Crucially, however, Mandeville did not claim a paradox of private vice, public virtue. The “benefits” that arose from individually vicious actions were morally compromised due to their being rooted in private self-seeking- one of Mandeville’s starkest challenges to his contemporaries, and a point which makes his fundamental philosophical commitments difficult to interpret. It is still disputed as to what, exactly, Mandeville thought the relation between private vice and public benefit should be: was he merely holding up a mirror to a corrupt society, satirizing those who claimed commercial opulence was straightforwardly compatible with virtue? Or did he seriously believe that modern commercial states should abandon their luxurious comforts for austere self-denial, so as to escape the paradox he alleged? Whatever the case, his notoriety arose from placing the two together, a little too closely for most of his readers’ taste and comfort. Mandeville’s paradox alleged, unapologetically, the tendency of men to hide vices behind socially acceptable forms of behavior, thereby appearing virtuous.  On the one hand, Mandeville wished to imply that common sense views are not as reliant on common sense as they first appear: what looks like virtuous behavior may in fact be disguised selfishness. On the other, those who preach virtue may turn out to be deluded hypocrites: real virtue would mean the collapse of all the benefits that supervene on private vice. Chief amongst Mandeville’s targets was Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of Shaftesbury, who claimed that a large-scale flourishing commercial society was compatible with individuals securing virtue by engaging in rational self-restraint whilst enjoying the benefits of economic advancement. For Mandeville, this was incorrect and preposterous: society could be prosperous and based on private vices, or poor and based on private virtues- but not both.

4. The Egoist “Culprit”

Mandeville’s psychological examination of humankind, often perceived as cynical, is a large part of his genius and also his infamy. Much in keeping with the physician he was, it is fitting that he took on the task of diagnosing society in order to expose what he believed to be the true motives of humankind. Nonetheless, there was a religious component in Mandeville’s thought. His man was necessarily fallen man: capable only of pleasing himself, the individual human being was a postlapsarian creature, irredeemably selfish and greedy for its own private pleasure, at which it always aimed even if it hid such self-seeking behind more respectable facades (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 348). Mandeville’s examination showed the ways in which people hid their real thoughts and motives behind a mask in order to fake sociability by not offending the selfish pride of their peers. Ironically, Mandeville’s own honesty led him into trouble: he boldly claimed vice was inevitably the foundation of a thriving society, insofar as all human beings had to act viciously because their status as selfish fallen men ensured that whatever displays they affected, at bottom selfishness always dictated their actions. All social virtues are evolved from self-love, which is at the core irredeemably vicious. Mandeville also challenged conventional moral terminology by taking a term like “vice” and showing that, despite its negative connotations, it was beneficial to society at large.

In its time, most responses to the Fable were designed as refutations (and understandably so, as few desired association with Mandeville’s central thesis) mainly focused on its analysis of the foundations of morality. To many, Mandeville was on par with Thomas Hobbes in promoting a doctrine of egoism which threatened to render all putative morality a function of morally-compromised selfishness. This accusation comes, in part, from “An Enquiry into the Origin of Moral Virtue” (1723) where Mandeville first proposes his theory of the skillful politician. Whether genuine theory, or more of Mandeville’s playful satirizing, the “Enquiry” was a provocative analysis designed to call into question contemporary notions of virtue. According to Mandeville, skillful politicians originally flattered the masses into believing that actions were vicious when done in order to gratify selfish passions, and virtuous when they were performed in contrast with immediate impulse of nature to acquire private pleasure, by instead suppressing this urge temporarily so as not to offend or harm others. But Mandeville’s central contention was that that no action was virtuous when inspired by selfish emotions. When men learned to temporarily suppress their urges for pleasure, they did not act from virtue. What they really did was find innovative ways to better secure their private pleasures, by engaging in forms of socially-sanctioned behavior they were flattered for- thus securing a more advanced form of pleasure than would be had by simply glorying over their peers in immediate displays of selfishness. Because he considered all natural human passions to be selfish, no action could be virtuous if it was done from a natural impulse which would itself be necessarily selfish. Accordingly, a human could not perform a virtuous act without some form of self-denial. Skillful politicians invented a sort of quasi-morality by which to control naturally selfish men- but because this involved the redirection of natural passion, not active self-denial, at root this was vice. The upshot of Mandeville’s vision was that excepting acts of Christian virtue assisted directly by God, all human actions were vicious and thus morally compromised. Unsurprisingly, this view of human nature was thought to be cynical and degrading, which is why he was often categorized with Hobbes, usually by critics of both, as a proponent of the serious egoist system denying the reality of moral distinctions.

Many critical reactions followed Mandeville’s depiction of humankind as selfish and unruly. He was often understood to deny the reality of virtue, with morality being merely the invention of skillful politicians in order to tame human passions. As Mandeville’s analysis of human nature developed throughout his life, he increasingly placed more emphasis on the peculiarity of human passions. His central estimation is that humankind is filled and predominantly governed by the passion of pride, and even when one seems to be acting contrarily, he or she is doing so out of some form of self-interest. He spends a considerable amount of time satirizing “polite” societies whose members imagine their actions to be entirely benevolent. Statements like “Pride and Vanity have built more Hospitals than all the Virtues together” are used to point out the real motives behind seemingly charitable actions (The Fable, Vol. 1, pg. 294). Pride is central to Mandeville’s analysis because it accounts for human actions performed in order to appear selfless to gain public honor, but which can be made into public benefits. It takes the central role in the skillful politician’s plan to socialize humanity through flattery, offering honor as an ever-renewable prize to anyone who would deny his or her immediate self-interest for the sake of another.

For Mandeville, one problem that arose from this account was over the exact role of skillful politicians in mankind’s societal development. How could it be, if men were only able to please themselves, that some (these skillful politicians) could know enough to control others by instigating a system of social virtues? The second volume of the Fable was written to elucidate difficulties such as these and to explain several things “that were obscure and only hinted at in the First.” (The Fable, Vol. II, pg. vi) To accomplish this task, he fashioned six dialogues between interlocutors Cleomenes, who was an advocate for the Fable, and Horatio, described as one who found great delight in Lord Shaftesbury’s writings. These dialogues provided, among other topics, an explanation of how humankind transitioned from its original state of unrestrained self-pleasing into a complex functioning society. Pride was still central to this analysis, but because of the intricacy and confusion behind such a word as pride, Mandeville introduced a helpful distinction between “self-love” and “self-liking”. Self-liking was identified as the cause of pride and shame and accounted for the human need to gain approval from others, whereas self-love referred to material needs of the body; he asserted that the seeds of politeness were lodged within self-love and self-liking.

In part, this distinction came as response to Joseph Butler who claimed that Mandeville’s version of psychological egoism fell apart upon application. By seeking to reduce the consequences that stemmed from Mandeville’s exposure of the hypocrisy of acting for public benefit, Butler argued the compatibility of self-love and benevolence. He did this by making self-love a general, not a particular passion and in doing so, he made the object of self-love happiness. Happiness, then, would be entirely in the interest of moral subjects. Butler held that self-love was compatible with benevolence because calculating long-term interests led to virtuous action. To Mandeville, however, this avoided the main point by failing to ask the central ethical question: how the distinction between moral and non-moral action can be made if moral acts are indistinguishable from self-interested ones. This second volume of the Fable dismisses many of Butler’s criticisms as ignorant, but Mandeville did realize that his notion of pride needed to be re-conceptualized because it was a loaded term and yet was central to his estimation. According to Mandeville, Butler’s error –leading him to claim Mandeville’s system collapsed incoherently– was failing to recognize that men first had to like themselves, but could only do so through other’s recognition and then approbation. Mandeville upheld that self-love is given to all for self-preservation, but we cannot love what we dislike and so we must genuinely like our own being. He alleged that nature caused us to value ourselves above our real worth and so in order to confirm the good opinions we have of ourselves, we flock together to have these notions affirmed. He wrote, “an untaught Man would desire every body that came near him, to agree with him in the Opinion of his superiour Worth, and be angry, as far as his Fear would let him, with all that should refuse it: He would be highly delighted with, and love every body, whom he thought to have a good Opinion of him” (The Fable, Vol. II, pg. 138-9). So, he thought even in an instance where a group of men was fully fed, within less than a half an hour self-liking would lead to a desire for superiority in some way, be it through strength, cunning, or some other grander quality.

Mandeville thought introducing the distinction between “self-liking” and “self-love” rectified confusions over the role of pride. Humans have a deeply rooted psychological need for approbation, and this can drive us to ensure we truly possess the qualities we admire in others. In fact, he claimed self-liking is so necessary to beings who indulge it that people can taste no pleasure without it. Mandeville gives an example of the extremities of this need­­ by claiming self-liking can even drive one to suicide if he or she fails to receive the approbation of others. Still, Mandeville maintains that because our motivation is for the pleasure of a good opinion of ourselves along with a good reputation, our achievement of virtuous character traits, even if genuinely desired, is not true virtue. The motivation is selfish and, consequently, not virtuous.

A large part of Mandeville’s later work focused on critiquing theorists like Berkeley, Law, and Shaftesbury. He particularly criticized Shaftesbury who claimed that human benevolence was natural and that men could act disinterestedly without regard to pride. Mandeville opposed the search for this objective standard of morality as being no better than “a Wild-Goose-Chace that is little to be depended on” (The Fable, Vol. I, p. 331). He thought that impressing upon people that they could be virtuous without self-denial would be a “vast inlet to hypocrisy,” not only deceiving everyone else, but also themselves (The Fable, Vol. I, p. 331). Mandeville aimed to show that, by using his own rigorous and austere standards of morality, his opponents had never performed a virtuous act in their lives; furthermore, if everyone must live up to these ideals, it would mean the collapse of modern society. Thus by alleging the difficulty of achieving virtue and the usefulness of vice, his paradox seemed to set a trap. Francis Hutcheson took up this debate in defense of Shaftesbury in order to establish an alternate account of human virtue to show how humanity could naturally be virtuous by acting from disinterested benevolence. He found the Fable’s outcome detestable in that it reduced societal virtue to passion and claimed this constituted a comprehensive system of sociability. Hutcheson considered a proper moralist to be one who promoted virtue by demonstrating that it is within one’s own best interest to act virtuously. He argued, by constructing his theory of the moral sense, that virtue was pleasurable and in complete accordance with one’s nature. Still, even with this radical departure from Mandeville’s conclusions, both undoubtedly agreed that reason could not sufficiently supply a standard for action: one must begin with an examination of human nature.

Other philosophers took the Fable in a less outraged and condemnatory fashion than Hutcheson. Instead of agreeing with Mandeville that self-interest negated moral worth and attempting to show that human action could be entirely disinterested, Hume agreed with substantial aspects of his basic analysis, but pointed out that if good things result from vice, then there is something deeply incorrect in retaining the terminology of vice after all. Hume considered Hutcheson’s conclusion— that we give our approvals because we are pleased naturally by the actions we find virtuous— to be incorrect. Hume noted, much like Mandeville, that our sense of duty or morality solely occurs in civilization, and he aligns himself more closely with Mandeville than Hutcheson when accounting for human sociability.

It is, perhaps, through Jean-Jacques Rousseau that Mandeville’s naturalistic account of human sociability found its most important messenger. In 1756, Adam Smith, in his review of Rousseau’s Discourse on the Origins of Inequality remarked how Mandeville’s second volume of the Fable gave occasion to Rousseau’s system. Rousseau and Mandeville both deny the natural sociability of man and equally stress the gradual evolution of society. For Rousseau, mankind was endowed with pity, or a “natural repugnance at seeing any other sensible being and particularly any of our own species, suffer pain or death” (Discourse on the Origins of Inequality). This pity or compassion plays a large part in modifying amour de soi-même (self-respect) and making it humane. He saw this passion as a natural and acknowledged that Mandeville agreed. What Mandeville failed to see, thought Rousseau, was that from this pity came all of the other societal virtues.

Smith was also influenced by Mandeville, but likewise disagreed with the supposition that people are wholly selfish, and his Theory of Moral Sentiments spends considerable time debunking the positions of Hobbes and Mandeville accordingly. Smith was able to circumvent this purely self-interested account by drawing on the role of sympathy. He supposed the whole account of self-interest as found in Hobbes’s and Mandeville’s systems caused such commotion in the world because of misapprehensions on the role of sympathy. Smith determined that an operational system of morals was partly based on its capacity to account for a good theory of fellow feeling. So, for example, Mandeville claimed that one’s motivation to help a beggar on the streets would stem from passions like pity that govern humankind: to walk away from someone in need would raise pity within one’s self in such way as to cause psychological harm, and therefore any help given would be performed in order to relieve the unease of seeing another in suffering.

Smith also considered Mandeville’s claim that humans only associated with one another to receive pleasure from the esteem they sought. While Smith did not wholly accept this, they both agreed about the enticing nature of public praise and that it can, at times, be a more powerful desire than accumulation of money. Smith responds directly to Mandeville on this point in the Theory of Moral Sentiments, paying particular attention to Mandeville’s account of the role of pride. Smith rejects Mandeville’s contention that all public spirit and self-sacrifice are merely clever ways to receive the praise of society. He gets around this by drawing a distinction between the desire to become praise-worthy, which is not vice, and the desire of frivolous praise for anything whatsoever. He claims there is a tricky similarity between the two that has been exaggerated by Mandeville, but the distinction is made by separating vanity from the love of true glory. Both are passions, but one is reasonable while the other is ridiculous. Significantly, though, Smith never lays to rest the importance of motivation to one’s overall actions and acknowledges how there are alternate motivations to act which employ both the role of sympathy and self-interest, e.g., one may donate out of some true feeling from sympathy, all the while knowing the move is socially advantageous. Smith gives some praise to Mandeville’s licentious system, because even though it was ultimately incorrect, it could not have made so much noise in the world if it had not, in some way, bordered upon truth. Smith noted it was because of Mandeville’s clever, yet misplaced analysis of human nature that people began to feel the connection between economic activity and human desire.

5. On Charity

In Mandeville’s “Vindication” of the Fable, he proposed that the reason for its sudden popularity may have been his “An Essay on Charity and Charity-Schools” (1723). In this essay Mandeville took his theory from fable to applied social criticism as he claimed that charity is often mistook for pity and compassion. Pity and compassion, as opposed to charity, can be traced back to a desire to think well of one’s self. This “charity”, then, would not be virtuous action but vicious, and therefore worthy of examination. To say Mandeville was unpopular for writing against the formation of charity schools would be an understatement: charity schools were highly regarded and were the most popular form of benevolence in eighteenth-century England. Initiated near the end of the seventeenth century, they were the predominant form of education for the poor. Donning a charitable temperature, these schools provided ways to impose virtuous qualities into the minds of poor children. The common attitude toward these children was rather derogatory and often depicted them as “rough” because they came from pickpockets, idlers and beggars of society. The curriculum within charity schools was overtly religious, attempting to instill moral and religious habits so as to turn these children into polite members of society.

Bernard Mandeville opposed the formation of charity schools, and while his disagreement may seem harsh, it is a practical example of the kind of hypocrisy he contested. Mandeville challenged the use of the word “charity” in description of these schools, and claimed that they were formed not out of the virtue of charity, but out of the passion of pity. To him, passions like pity are acted upon to relieve one’s own self the unease of seeing another in suffering. He explains that, in order for an action to be virtuous, there must not be an impure motive. Acts performed on behalf of friends and family, or done in order to gain honor and public respect could not be charitable. If charity were reducible to pity, then charity itself would be an undiscriminating universal passion and be of no use to society. To him, charity schools were simply clever manifestations of pride. Beginning the essay with his own rigid definition of charity, Mandeville clearly intended to show that these schools were not worthy to be so entitled.

Mandeville argued pity and compassion were accounted for by human passions, and noted, that though it may seem odd, we are controlled by self-love that drives us to relieve these feelings. He drew a sketch of self-love and pity working together with his beggar example. Imagine a beggar on the streets appeals to you by explaining his situation, showing off his wound in need of medical attention, and then implores you to show virtue for Jesus Christ’s sake by giving him some money. His image raises within you a sense of pity, and you feel compelled to give him money. Mandeville claimed the beggar is a master in this art of capturing pity and makes his marks buy their peace. It is our self-love alone that motivates us to give money to this beggar, which cannot constitute an act of charity.

The part of the “Essay” that would have been truly offensive to those in Mandeville’s time comes when he turns accusations of villainy not to so-called objects of charity but to people with wealth and education. He attacks those of good reputation and claims that the reason they have this good reputation is that they have hidden their private vice behind public benefit. He compared charity schools to a vogue in the fashion of hooped petticoats, and pointed out no reason could be given for either. Moreover, he considered these schools to be pernicious, as they would weaken the established social hierarchies on which the British state depended. Charity schools were fashionable to support, but beyond this, Mandeville found little reason for their continuation.

Mandeville disagreed with the entire motivation behind charity schools, seeing them as nothing but a system where men he most opposed could impart their views onto following generations. Mandeville thought, as was common in his day, that people were born into their life stations and should seek to be content within them. He still considered charity to be necessary at times because the helpless should be looked after, but he believed the model of charity schools would only ever promote laziness in society. This view becomes less cynical when considering his support of economic activity as a solution. Mandeville approved of the growing industry and he saw economic advancements as necessary pieces to advancing civilization because standards were being raised, for example: today’s poor were living like yesterday’s rich. He alleged that British prosperity depended, in part, on exploiting the laboring poor, and so it was not the economic advancement he challenged, but rather the hypocrisy of individuals who thought that by their public benefit, they were advancing society. These citizens were acting out of self-love not charity, and if this could be realized, then instances like charity schools could be given over to the critical examination Mandeville thought they deserved.

6. Influence on Economic Theory

Mandeville’s defense of luxury stands amidst the forefront of economic discussions in the eighteenth century. While he charged that a state founded on selfishness is corrupt, he also showed that society must be based upon that selfishness and that no state can be great without embracing luxury. His argument that luxury was harmless to social (if not personal, spiritual) prosperity and necessary for economic flourishing flew in the face of traditional ascetic moral codes embedded in certain Christian teaching, as well as earlier republican political theory which claimed that luxury rendered a population impotent and corrupted individuals, leading to the internal decay of the polity and its vulnerability to external conquest.

Mandeville’s most prevalent influence on economic theory was through Adam Smith. Both of them by and large supported market-based systems of free resource allocation. Mandeville’s commanding point, which could not be ignored by future economists, was that without indulgence there would be little, if any, consumer spending. Mandeville certainly influenced Smith’s economic thought, as Smith picks up the private vice, public benefit paradox in order to claim that one of the original principles in human nature is to barter and trade for private advantage, which then propels commercial society forward resulting in economic advancement and prosperity. This paradox raised the question of whether self-interested action was vicious, and further proposed that by attending to one’s own needs, one could actually contribute to society in positive ways. In his Wealth of Nations, Smith borrowed largely from Mandeville’s earlier position on the usefulness of self-interested behavior, though he denied the scandalous implications Mandeville provided. It is speculated as to whether Smith inherited his invisible hand notion from the paradox Mandeville presented–although the phrase was never explicitly mentioned in Mandeville’s writing– because Smith mentions the invisible hand when he provides an example of unintended public interest brought about by intending one’s own gain. Influence is also found in the division of labor theory, which was one of Smith’s tenets of modern economic thought.

Most notably, Mandeville’s work contains the genealogical origins of laissez-faire economic theory- in particular as put forward by Friedrich von Hayek, one of the Fable’s keenest twentieth-century admirers. The similarity lies in Mandeville’s claim that self-seeking individuals will interact in mutually beneficial ways without being coordinated from above, while a natural check on their interactions will result in public benefit as the outcome. Interference with this self-seeking will pervert the balance- as alleged in the conclusion of the Grumbling Hive. Because of this notion of order emerging through voluntarily, unregulated activities, Hayek credits Mandeville as being one of the first to put forward the concept of “spontaneous order”. Using the same sort of language, Mandeville remarked, “how the short-sighted Wisdom, of perhaps well-meaning People, may rob us of a Felicity, that would flow spontaneously from the Nature of every large Society, if none were to divert or interrupt the Stream” (The Fable, Vol. II, p. 427). Hayek argued that instead of solely viewing Mandeville through the lens of a moral philosopher, we should see him as a great psychologist who may not have contributed much by way of answers, but certainly asked the right questions using an evolutionary approach to understand society. Hayek even goes so far as to claim that Darwin, in many respects, is the culmination of a development Mandeville started more than any other single person. This approach– rather than assuming society was the product of planning and conscious design by elites– helped spark new empirical explorations. Mandeville saw the sociability of man as arising from two things: the many desires he has, and the opposition met while attempting to satisfy these desires. He brings to the foreground the beneficial effects of luxury, and this was part of what interested John Maynard Keynes. In his General Theory, Keynes cited Mandeville as a source for his position in emphasizing the positive effects of consumption (aggregate demand). This stood in opposition to classical economics who held up production (aggregate supply) as the motor of economic growth.

While there was no systematic formulation of laissez-faire theory in Mandeville’s writing, it was an important literary source for the doctrine, namely, its analysis of human selfishness and the societal benefits ironically and unintentionally stemming therefrom. It is precisely through these attempts to reconcile the paradox of private vices, public benefits that we find some of the first leanings toward a modern utilitarian attitude. Accordingly, Mandeville is thought to be one its most fundamental and early philosophical influences, as transmitted in particular by David Hume and Adam Smith to Jeremy Bentham and then John Stuart Mill.

7. References and Further Reading

Bernard Mandeville was an outspoken and controversial author and an equally interesting character. He claims that he wrote mostly for his own entertainment, but the vast number of essays, poems, and stories he composed should, perhaps, be allowed to speak for themselves. The best modern edition and collection of Mandeville’s work is F.B. Kaye’s The Fable of the Bees. The textual references throughout the article were from Kaye’s Fable through the Online Library of Liberty (1988). The following list of Mandeville’s work is adapted from and indebted to Kaye’s own work on Bernard Mandeville.

a. Works by Mandeville

  • Bernandi a Mandeville de Medicina Oratorio Scholastica. Rotterdam: Typis Regneri Leers, 1685.
  • Disputatio Philosophica de Brutorum Operationibus. Leyden: Apud Abrahamum Elzevier, Academiae Typograph, 1689.
  • Disputatio Medica Inauguralis de Chylosi Vitiata. Leyden: Apud Abrahamum Elzevier, Academiae Typograph, 1691.
  • The Pamphleteers: A Satyr. London, 1703.
  • Some Fables after the Easie and Familiar Method of Monsieur de la Fontaine. London, 1703.
  • Aesop Dress’d; or a Collection of Fables Writ in Familiar Verse. By B. Mandeville, M.D. London: Printed for Richard Wellington, 1704.
  • Typhon: or The Wars Between the Gods and Giants; A Burlesque Poem in Imitation of the Comical Mons. Scarron. London: Printed for J. Pero & S. Illidge, and sold by J. Nutt, 1704.
  • The Grumbling Hive: or, Knaves Turn’d Honest. London: Printed for Sam. Ballard and sold by A. Baldwin, 1705.
  •  The Virgin Unmask’d: or, Female Dialogues Betwixt an Elderly Maiden Lady, and Her Niece, On Several Diverting Discourses on Love, Marriage, Memoirs, and Morals of the Times. London: Sold by J. Morphew & J. Woodward, 1709.
  • A Treatise of the Hypochondriack and Hysterick Passions, Vulgarly call’d the Hypo in Men and Vapours in Women… By B. de Mandeville, M.D. London: Printed for the author, D. Leach, W. Taylor & J. Woodward, 1711.
  • Wishes to a Godson, with Other Miscellany Poems, By B.M. London: Printed for J. Baker, 1712.
  • The Fable of the Bees: or, Private Vices, Publick Benefits. London: Printed for J. Roberts, 1714.
  • The Mischiefs that Ought Justly to be Apprehended from a Whig-Government. London: Printed for J. Roberts, 1714.
  • Free Thoughts on Religion, the Church and National Happiness, By B.M. London: Sold by T. Jauncy & J. Roberts, 1720.
  • A Modest Defence of Publick Stews… by a Layman. London: Printed by A. Moore, 1724.
  • An Enquiry into the Cause of the Frequent Executions at Tyburn… by B. Mandeville, M.D. London: Sold by J. Roberts, 1725.
  • The Fable of the Bees. Part II. By the Author of the First. London: Sold by J. Roberts, 1729.
  • An Enquiry into the Origin of Honour, and the Usefulness of Christianity in War. By the Author of the Fable of the Bees. London: Printed for J. Brotherton, 1732.
  • A Letter to Dion, Occasion’d by his Book call’d Alciphron or The Minute Philosopher. By the Author of the Fable of the Bees. London: Sold by J. Roberts, 1732.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Cook, H. J. “Bernard Mandeville and the Therapy of ‘The Clever Politician’” Journal of the History of Ideas 60 (1999): 101-124.
    • On the clever politicians’ manipulation of people’s passions to make politics run smoothly.
  • Goldsmith, M.M. Private Vices, Public Benefits: Bernard Mandeville’s Social and Political Thought. Christchurch, New Zealand: Cybereditions Corporation, 2001.
    • A helpful monograph of Mandeville’s ideas placed in context of eighteenth-century England’s political atmosphere.
  • Hayek, F.A. The Trend of Economic Thinking: Essays on Political Economists and Economic History Volume III. Taylor & Francis e-Library, 2005.
    • See Hayek’s chapter 6 devoted to what he sees as two important Mandevillean contributions to the history of economics.
  • Heath, E. “Mandeville’s Bewitching Engine of Praise” History of Philosophy Quarterly 15 (1998): 205-226.
    • Offers Mandeville’s account of human nature and how government arises from a state of nature. Also depicts Mandeville as one of the first defenders of commercial modernity.
  • Hont, I. “The early Enlightenment debate on commerce and luxury” The Cambridge History of Eighteenth-Century Political Thought. 1st ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (2006): 377-418.
    • See especially pages 387-395 for a discussion of Mandeville’s place in the luxury debate.
  • Hundert, E.J. The Enlightenment’s Fable: Bernard Mandeville and the Discovery of Society. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
    • A comprehensive book which examines the strategies of Mandeville’s ideas and sources and how they lent to his eighteenth-century influence.
  • Hundert, E.J. The Fable of the Bees: And Other Writings. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1997.
    • An anthology with a wonderful, short introduction to Mandeville.
  • Jones, M.G. The Charity School Movement: A Study of Eighteenth Century Puritanism in Action. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1938.
    • A valuable study, especially helpful in understanding the context of Mandeville’s “An Essay on Charity and Charity-Schools”.
  • Kaye, F.B. Commentary and Introduction to The Fable of the Bees, 2 Volumes. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1924.
    • The best modern edition and collection of The Fable along with an introduction to Mandeville’s work.
  • Kaye, F.B. “The Writings of Bernard Mandeville: A Bibliographical Survey” The Journal of English and Germanic Philology 20 (1921): 419-467.
    • A scholarly survey of Mandeville’s writings.
  • Kerkhof, B. “A fatal attraction? Smith’s ‘Theory of moral sentiments’ and Mandeville’s ‘Fable’” History of Political Thought 16 no. 2 (1995): 219-233
    • A helpful article on Mandeville’s distinction between “self-liking” and “self-love”
  • Malcom, J. “One State of Nature: Mandeville and Rousseau” Journal of the History of Ideas 39 no. 1 (1978): 119-124.
    • A piece exploring the similarities between Mandeville and Rousseau’s state of nature and process of human sociability.
  • Primer, I. (ed.), Mandeville Studies: New Explorations in the Art and Thought of Dr. Bernard Mandeville (1670-1733). The Hague: Nijhoff, 1975.
    • A collection of various articles, including pieces on some of Mandeville’s minor writings and his relation to specific writers, such as: Defoe, Shaftesbury and Voltaire.
  • Primer, I. The Fable of the Bees Or Private Vices, Publick Benefits. New York: Capricorn Books, 1962.
    • A helpful edited edition good for a basic overview of Mandeville’s thought- complete with an introduction.
  • Runciman, D. Political Hypocrisy: The Mask of Power, from Hobbes to Orwell and Beyond. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2008.
    • In chapter 2 the author proposes two types of hypocrisy present in Mandeville’s analysis and demonstrates how, to Mandeville, certain kinds of hypocrisy are necessary whilst others are detestable.
  • Welchman, J. “Who Rebutted Bernard Mandeville?” History of Philosophy Quarterly 24 No. 1 (2007): 57-74.
    • On Mandeville and some of his moral interlocutors. It presents several attempts to rebut Mandeville made by Hutcheson, Butler, Berkeley, Hume, and Smith.


Author Information

Phyllis Vandenberg
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.


Abigail DeHart
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.