Karl Popper: Political Philosophy

popperAmong philosophers, Karl Popper (1902-1994) is best known for his contributions to the philosophy of science and epistemology. Most of his published work addressed philosophical problems in the natural sciences, especially physics; and Popper himself acknowledged that his primary interest was nature and not politics. However, his political thought has arguably had as great an impact as has his philosophy of science. This is certainly the case outside of the academy.  Among the educated general public, Popper is best known for his critique of totalitarianism and his defense of freedom, individualism, democracy and an “open society.” His political thought resides squarely within the camp of Enlightenment rationalism and humanism. He was a dogged opponent of totalitarianism, nationalism, fascism, romanticism, collectivism, and other kinds of (in Popper’s view) reactionary and irrational ideas.

Popper’s rejection of these ideas was anchored in a critique of the philosophical beliefs that, he argued, underpinned them, especially a flawed understanding of the scientific method. This approach is what gives Popper’s political thought its particular philosophical interest and originality—and its controversy, given that he locates the roots of totalitarianism in the ideas of some of the West’s most esteemed philosophers, ancient as well as modern. His defense of a freed and democratic society stems in large measure from his views on the scientific method and how it should be applied to politics, history and social science.  Indeed, his most important political texts—The Poverty of Historicism (1944) and The Open Society and Its Enemies (1945)—offer a kind of unified vision of science and politics.  As explained below, the people and institutions of the open society that Popper envisioned would be imbued with the same critical spirit that marks natural science, an attitude which Popper called critical rationalism. This openness to analysis and questioning was expected to foster social and political progress as well as to provide a political context that would allow the sciences to flourish.

Table of Contents

  1. The Critique of the Closed Society
    1. Open versus Closed Societies
    2. Holism, Essentialism and Historicism
    3. Hegel, Marx and Modern Historicism
    4. Utopian Social Engineering
  2. Freedom, Democracy and the Open Society
    1. Minimalist Democracy
    2. Piecemeal Social Engineering
    3. Negative Utilitarianism
    4. Libertarian, Conservative or Social Democrat?
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Literature
    2. Secondary Literature

1. The Critique of the Closed Society

A central aim of The Open Society and Its Enemies as well as The Poverty of Historicism was to explain the origin and nature of totalitarianism. In particular, the rise of fascism, including in Popper’s native Austria, and the ensuing Second World War prompted Popper to begin writing these two essays in the late 1930s and early 1940s, while he was teaching in New Zealand. He described these works as his “war effort” (Unended Quest, 115).

The arguments in the two essays overlap a great deal. (In fact, The Open Society began as a chapter for Poverty.) Yet there is a difference in emphasis.  The Poverty of Historicism is concerned principally with the methodology of the social sciences, and, in particular, how a flawed idea, which Popper dubbed “historicism,” had led historians and social scientists astray methodologically and which also served as a handmaiden to tyranny. The Open Society, a much longer and, according to Popper, a more important work, included in-depth discussion of historicism and the methods of the social sciences. But it also featured an inquiry into the psychological and historical origins of totalitarianism, which he located in the nexus of a set of appealing but, he argued, false ideas. These included not only historicism but also what he labeled “holism” and “essentialism.” Together they formed the philosophical substrate of what Popper called the “closed society.” The “closed society” is what leads to totalitarianism.

a. Open versus Closed Societies

According to Popper, totalitarianism was not unique to the 20th century. Rather, it “belongs to a tradition which is just as old or just as young as our civilization itself” (Open Society, Vol. I, 1). In The Open Society, Popper’s search for the roots of totalitarianism took him back to ancient Greece. There he detected the emergence of what he called the first “open society” in democratic Athens of the 5th century B.C.E., Athenians, he argued, were the first to subject their own values, beliefs, institutions and traditions to critical scrutiny and Socrates and the city’s democratic politics exemplified this new attitude. But reactionary forces were unnerved by the instability and rapid social change that an open society had unleashed. (Socrates was indicted on charges of corrupting the youth and introducing new gods.) They sought to turn back the clock and return Athens to a society marked by rigid class hierarchy, conformity to the customs of the tribe, and uncritical deference to authority and tradition—a “closed society.” This move back to tribalism was motivated by a widely and deeply felt uneasiness that Popper called the “strain of civilization.” The structured and organic character of closed societies helps to satisfy a deep human need for regularity and a shared common life, Popper said.  In contrast, the individualism, freedom and personal responsibility that open societies necessarily engender leave many feeling isolated and anxious, but this anxiety, Popper said, must be born if we are to enjoy the greater benefits of living in an open society: freedom, social progress, growing knowledge, and enhanced cooperation. “It is the price we have to pay for being human” (Open Society Vol. 1, 176).

Popper charged that Plato emerged as the philosophical champion of the closed society and in the process laid the groundwork for totalitarianism. Betraying the open and critical temper of his mentor Socrates, in his Republic Plato devised an elaborate system that would arrest all political and social change and turn philosophy into an enforcer, rather than a challenger, of authority.  It would also reverse the tide of individualism and egalitarianism that had emerged in democratic Athens, establishing a hierarchical system in which the freedom and rights of the individual would be sacrificed to the collective needs of society.

Popper noted that Plato’s utopian vision in the Republic was in part inspired by Sparta, Athen’s enemy in the Peloponnesian War and, for Popper, an exemplar of the closed society. Spartan society focused almost exclusively on two goals: internal stability and military prowess. Toward these ends, the Spartan constitution sought to create a hive-like, martial society that always favored the needs of the collective over the individual and required a near total control over its citizenry. This included a primitive eugenics, in which newborn infants deemed insufficiently vigorous were tossed into a pit of water. Spartan males judged healthy enough to merit life were separated from their families at a young age and provided an education consisting mainly of military training. The training produced fearsome warriors who were indifferent to suffering, submissive to authority, and unwaveringly loyal to the city. Fighting for the city was an honor granted solely to the male citizenry, while the degrading toil of cultivating the land was the lot reserved to an enslaved tribe of fellow Greeks, the helots. Rigid censorship was imposed on the citizenry, as well as laws that strictly limited contact with foreigners. Under this system, Sparta became a dominant military power in ancient Greece, but, unsurprisingly, made no significant contributions to the arts and sciences. Popper described Sparta as an “arrested tribalism” that sought to stymie “equalitarian, democratic and individualistic ideologies,” such as found in Athens (Open Society Vol. 1, 182). It was no coincidence, he said, that the Nazis and other modern-day totalitarians were also inspired by the Spartans.

b. Holism, Essentialism and Historicism

Popper charged that three deep philosophical predispositions underpinned Plato’s defense of the closed society and, indeed, subsequent defenses of the closed society during the next two-and-a-half millennia. These ideas were holism, essentialism, and historicism.

Holism may be defined as the view that adequate understanding of certain kinds of entities requires understanding them as a whole. This is often held to be true for biological and social systems, for example, an organism, an ecosystem, an economy, or a culture.  A corollary that is typically held to follow from this view is that such entities have properties that cannot be reduced to the entities’ constituent parts. For instance, some philosophers argue that human consciousness is an emergent phenomenon whose properties cannot be explained solely by the properties of the physical components (nerve cells, neurotransmitters, and so forth) that comprise the human brain. Similarly, those who advocate a holistic approach to social inquiry argue that social entities cannot be reduced to the properties of the individuals that comprise them. That is, they reject methodological individualism and support methodological holism, as Popper called it.

Plato’s holism, Popper argued, was reflected in his view that the city—the Greek polis—was prior to and, in a sense, more real than the individuals who resided in it. For Plato “[o]nly a stable whole, the permanent collective, has reality, not the passing individuals” (Open Society Vol. 1, 80). This view in turn implied that the city has real needs that supersede those of individuals and was thus the source of Plato’s ethical collectivism.  According to Popper, Plato believed that a just society required individuals to sacrifice their needs to the interests of the state. “Justice for [Plato],” he wrote, “is nothing but health, unity and stability of the collective body” (OSE I, 106). Popper saw this as profoundly dangerous. In fact, he said, the view that some collective social entity—be it, for example, a city, a state, society, a nation, or a race—has needs that are prior and superior to the needs of actual living persons is a central ethical tenet of all totalitarian systems, whether ancient or modern. Nazis, for instance, emphasized the needs of the Aryan race to justify their brutal policies, whereas communists in the Soviet Union spoke of class aims and interests as the motor of history to which the individual must bend. The needs of the race or class superseded the needs of individuals. In contrast, Popper held, members of an open society see the state and other social institutions as human designed, subject to rational scrutiny, and always serving the interests of individuals—and never the other way around. True justice entails equal treatment of individuals rather than Plato’s organistic view, in which justice is identified as a well functioning state.

Also abetting Plato’s support for a closed society was a doctrine that Popper named “methodological essentialism”. Adherents of this view claim “that it is the task of pure knowledge or ‘science’ to discover and to describe the true nature of things, i.e., their hidden reality or essence” (Open Society Vol. 1, 31).  Plato’s theory of the Forms exemplified this approach.  According to Plato, understanding of any kind of thing—for example, a bed, a triangle, a human being, or a city—requires understanding what Plato called its Form. The Forms are timeless, unchanging and perfect exemplars of sensible things found in our world. Coming to understand a Form, Plato believed, requires rational examination of its essence. Such understanding is governed by a kind of intuition rather than empirical inquiry. For instance, mathematical intuition provides the route to understanding the essential nature of triangles—that is, their Form—as opposed to attempting to understand the nature of triangles by measuring and comparing actual sensible triangles found in our world.

Although Forms are eternal and unchanging, Plato held that the imperfect copies of them that we encounter in the sensible world invariably undergo decay. Extending this theory presented a political problem for Plato. In fact, according to Popper, the disposition to decay was the core political problem that Plato’s philosophy sought to remedy. The very nature of the world is such that human beings and the institutions that they create tend to degrade over time. For Plato, this included cities, which he believed were imperfect copies of the Form of the city. This view of the city, informed by Plato’s methodological essentialism, produced a peculiar political science, Popper argued. It required, first, understanding the true and best nature of the city, that is, its Form. Second, in order to determine how to arrest (or at least slow) the city’s decay from its ideal nature, the study of politics must seek to uncover the laws or principles that govern the city’s natural tendency towards decay and thereby to halt the degradation. Thus Plato’s essentialism led him to seek a theory of historical change—a theory that brings order and intelligibility to the constant flux of our world. That is, Plato’s essentialism led to what Popper labeled “historicism.”

Historicism is the view that history is governed by historical laws or principles and, further, that history has a necessary direction and end-point. This being so, historicists believe that the aim of philosophy—and, later, history and social science—must be to predict the future course of society by uncovering the laws or principles that govern history. Historicism is a very old view, Popper said, predating Athens of the 5th century B.C.E. Early Greek versions of historicism held that the development of cities naturally and necessarily moves in cycles: a golden age followed by inevitable decay and collapse, which in some versions paves the way for rebirth and a new golden age.  In Plato’s version of this “law of decay,” the ideal city by turns degenerates from timarchy (rule by a military class) to oligarchy to democracy and then, finally, dictatorship. But Plato did not merely describe the gradual degeneration of the city; he offered a philosophical explanation of it, which relied upon his theory of the Forms and thus methodological essentialism. Going further, Plato sought to provide a way to arrest this natural tendency toward decay. This, Popper argued, was the deep aim of the utopian society developed in the Republic—a newly fabricated closed society as the solution to natural tendency toward moral and political decline. It required creation of a rigid and hierarchical class society governed by philosopher kings, whose knowledge of the Forms would stave off decay as well as ensure the rulers’ incorruptibility. Tumultuous democratic Athens would be replaced with a stable and unchanging society. Plato saw this as justice, but Popper argued that it had all the hallmarks of totalitarianism, including rigid hierarchy, censorship, collectivism, central planning—all of which would be reinforced through propaganda and deception, or, as Plato called them, “noble lies.”

Plato’s deep mistrust of democracy was no doubt in part a product of experience. As a young man he saw the citizens of Athens, under the influence of demagogues, back ill-advised military campaigns that ultimately led to the Spartan victory over the city in 404 B.C.E. After democracy was reestablished following the Spartan occupiers’ departure in 403 B.C.E., he witnessed the Athenian people’s vote to execute its wisest citizen, Socrates.  Popper as a young man had also witnessed the collapse of democracy, in his native Austria and throughout Europe. But he drew very different lessons from that experience. For him, democracy remained a bulwark against tyranny, not its handmaiden.  For reasons explained in the next section, Popper held that by rejecting democracy Plato’s system destroyed not only individual freedom but also the conditions for social, political, scientific and moral progress.

Popper’s criticism of Plato sparked a lively and contentious debate. Prior to publication of The Open Society, Plato was widely regarded as the wellspring of enlightened humanism in the Western tradition.  Popper’s recasting of Plato as a proto-fascist was scandalous. Classists rose to Plato’s defense and accused Popper of reading Plato ahistorically, using dubious or tendentious translations of his words, and failing to appreciate the ironic and literary elements in Plato’s dialogues. These criticisms exposed errors in Popper’s scholarship. But Popper was nonetheless successful in drawing attention to potential totalitarian dangers of Plato’s utopianism. Subsequent scholarship could not avoid addressing his arguments.

Although Plato was the principle target of Popper’s criticisms in the Open Society, he also detected dangerous tendencies in other ancient Greek philosophers’ ideas, most notably Aristotle’s. Plato’s greatest student, Popper argued, had inherited his teacher’s essentialism but had given it a teleological twist. Like Plato, Aristotle believed that knowledge of an entity required grasping its essence. However, Plato and Aristotle differed in their understanding of the relationship between an entity’s essence and how that essence was manifested in the sensible world. Plato held that the entities found in the sensible world were imperfect, decaying representation of the Forms. Thus his understanding of history, Popper argued, was ultimately pessimistic: the world degrades over time. Plato’s politics was an attempt to arrest or at least slow this degradation.  In contrast, Aristotle understood an entity’s essence as a bundle of potentialities that become manifest as the entity develops through time. An entity’s essence acts as a kind of internal motor that impels the entity toward its fullest development, or what Aristotle called its final cause. The oak tree, for example, is the final cause of an acorn, the end towards which it strives.

Herein Popper detected an implicit historicism in Aristotle’s epistemology. Though Aristotle himself produced no theory of history, his essentialism wedded to his teleology naturally lent itself to the notion that a person’s or a state’s true nature can only be understood as it is revealed through time. “Only if a person or a state develops, and only by way of its history, can we get to know anything about its ‘hidden undeveloped essence’” (Open Society Vol. 1I, 7). Further, Popper argued that Aristotle’s essentialism naturally aligned with the notion of historical destiny: a state’s or a nation’s development is predetermined by its “hidden undeveloped essence.”

Popper believed that he had revealed deep links between ancient Greek philosophy and hostility toward the open society. In Plato’s essentialism, collectivism, holism and historicism, Popper detected the philosophical underpinning for Plato’s ancient totalitarian project. As we shall see in the next section, Popper argued that these very same ideas were at the heart of modern totalitarianism, too. Though for Popper Plato was the most important ancient enemy of the open society, in Aristotle’s teleological essentialism Popper found a key link connecting ancient and modern historicism. In fact, the idea of historical destiny that Aristotle’s thought generated was at the core of the thought of two 19th century philosophers, G.W.F. Hegel and Karl Marx, whom Popper charged with facilitating the emergence of modern closed societies. The “far-reaching historicist consequences” of Aristotle’s essentialism “were slumbering for more than twenty centuries, ‘hidden and undeveloped’,” until the advent of Hegel’s philosophical system (Open Society Vol. 1, 8).

c. Hegel, Marx and Modern Historicism

History was central to both Hegel’s and Marx’s philosophy, and for Popper their ideas exemplified historicist thinking and the political dangers that it entailed. Hegel’s historicism was reflected in his view that the dialectal interaction of ideas was the motor of history. The evolution and gradual improvement of philosophical, ethical, political and religious ideas determines the march of history, Hegel argued. History, which Hegel sometimes described as the gradual unfolding of “Reason,” comes to an end when all the internal contradictions in human ideas are finally resolved.

Marx’s historical materialism famously inverted Hegel’s philosophy. For Marx, history was a succession of economic and political systems, or “modes of production” in Marx’s language. As technological innovations and new ways of organizing production led to improvements in a society’s capacity to meet human material needs, new modes of production would emerge. In each new mode of production, the political and legal system, as well as the dominant moral and religious values and practices, would reflect the interests of those who controlled the new productive system. Marx believed that the capitalist mode of production was the penultimate stage of human history. The productive power unleashed by new technologies and factory production under capitalism was ultimately incompatible with capitalism as an economic and political system, which was marked by inefficiency, instability and injustice.  Marx predicted that these flaws would inevitably lead to revolution followed by establishment of communist society. This final stage of human development would be one of material abundance and true freedom and equality for all.

According to Popper, though they disagreed on the mechanism that directed human social evolution, both Hegel and Marx, like Plato, were historicists because they believed that trans-historical laws governed human history.  This was the key point for Popper, as well as the key error and danger.

The deep methodological flaw of historicism, according to Popper, is that historicists wrongly see the goal of social science as historical forecast—to predict the general course of history. But such prediction is not possible, Popper said. He provided two arguments that he said demonstrated its impossibility. The first was a succinct logical argument: Human knowledge grows and changes overtime, and knowledge in turn affects social events. (That knowledge might be, for example, a scientific theory, a social theory, or an ethical or religious idea.) We cannot predict what we will know in the future (otherwise we would already know it), therefore we cannot predict the future.  As long as it is granted that knowledge affects social behavior and that knowledge changes overtime—two premises that Popper considered incontestable—then the view that we can predict the future cannot be true and historicism must be rejected. This argument, it should be noted, also reflected Popper’s judgment that the universe is nondeterministic: that is, he believed that prior conditions and the laws of nature do not completely causally determine the future, including human ideas and actions. Our universe is an “open” universe, he said.

Popper’s second argument against the possibility of historical forecasting focused on the role of laws in social explanations. According to Popper, historicists wrongly believe that genuine social science must be a kind of “theoretical history” in which the aim is to uncover laws of historical development that explain and predict the course of history (Poverty of Historicism, 39). But Popper contended that this represents a fundamental misunderstanding of scientific laws. In fact, Popper argued, there is no such thing as a law of historical development. That is, there are no trans-historical laws that determine the transition from one historical period to the next.  Failure to understand why this is so represented a deep philosophical error. There may be sociological laws that govern human behavior within particular social systems or institutions, Popper said. For instance, the laws of supply and demand are kinds of social laws governing market economies. But the future course of history cannot be predicted and, in particular, laws that govern the general trajectory of history do not exist. Popper does not deny that there can be historical trends—a tendency towards greater freedom and equality, more wealth or better technology, for instance, but unlike genuine laws, trends are always dependent upon conditions. Change the conditions and the trends may alter or disappear. A trend towards greater freedom or knowledge could be disrupted by, say, the outbreak of a pandemic disease or the emergence of a new technology that facilitates authoritarian regimes. Popper acknowledges that in certain cases natural scientists can predict the future—even the distance future—with some confidence, as is the case with astronomy, for instance. But this type of successful long-range forecasting can occur only in physical systems that are “well-isolated, stationary and recurrent,” such as the solar system (Conjectures and Refutations, 339). Social systems can never be isolated and stationary, however.

d. Utopian Social Engineering

So historicism as social science is deeply defective, according to Popper. But he also argued that it was politically dangerous and that this danger stemmed from historicism’s natural and close allegiance with what Popper called “utopian social engineering.” Such social planning “aims at remodeling the ‘whole of society’ in accordance with a definite plan or blueprint,” as opposed to social planning that aims at gradual and limited adjustments. Popper admitted that the alliance between historicism and utopian engineering was “somewhat strange” (Poverty of Historicism, 73). Because historicists believe that laws determine the course of history, from their vantage it is ultimately pointless to try to engineer social change. Just as a meteorologist can forecast the weather, but not alter it, the same holds for social scientists, historicists believe. They can predict future social developments, but not cause or alter them. Thus “out-and-out historicism” is against utopian planning—or even against social planning altogether (Open Society Vol. 1, 157). For this reason Marx rejected attempts to design a socialist system; in fact he derided such projects as “utopian.” Nonetheless, the connection between historicism and utopian planning remains strong, Popper insisted. Why?

First, historicism and utopian engineering share a connection to utopianism. Utopians seek to establish an ideal state of some kind, one in which all conflicts in social life are resolved and ultimate human ends—for example, freedom, equality, true happiness—are somehow reconciled and fully realized. Attaining this final goal requires radical overhaul of the existing social world and thus naturally suggests the need for utopian social engineering.  Many versions of historicism are thus inclined towards utopianism. As noted above, both Marx’s and Hegel’s theory of history, for instance, predict an end to history in which all social contradictions will be permanently resolved. Second, historicism and utopian social engineering both tend to embrace holism. Popper said that historicists, like utopian engineers, typically believe that “society as a whole” is the proper object of scientific inquiry. For the historicist, society must be understood in terms of social wholes, and to understand the deep forces that move the social wholes, you must understand the laws of history. Thus the historicists’ anticipation of the coming utopia, and their knowledge of the historical tendencies that will bring it about, may tempt them to try to intervene in the historical process and therefore, as Marx said, “lessen the birth pangs” associated with the arrival of the new social order. So while a philosophically consistent historicism might seem to lead to political quiescence, the fact is that historicists often cannot resist political engagement. In addition, Popper noted that even less radical versions of historicism, such as Plato’s, permit human intervention.

Popper argued that utopian engineering, though superficially attractive, is fatally flawed: it invariably leads to multitudinous unintended and usually unwelcome consequences. The social world is so complex, and our understanding of it so incomplete, that the full impact of any imposed change to it, especially grand scale change, can never be foreseen. But, because of their unwarranted faith in their historical prophesies, the utopian engineers will be methodologically ill equipped to deal with this reality. The unintended consequences will be unanticipated, and he or she will be forced to respond to them in a haphazard and ill-informed manner: “[T]he greater the holistic changes attempted, the greater are their unintended and largely unexpected repercussions, forcing on the holistic engineer the expedient of piecemeal improvisation” or the “notorious phenomenon of unplanned planning (Poverty of Historicism, 68-69). One particularly important cause of unintended consequences that utopian engineers are generally blind to is what Popper called the “human factor” in all institutional design. Institutions can never wholly govern individuals’ behavior, he said, as human choice and human idiosyncrasies will ensure this. Thus no matter how thoroughly and carefully an institution is designed, the fact that institutions are filled with human beings results in a certain degree of unpredictability in their operation. But the historicists’ holism leads them to believe that individuals are merely pawns in the social system, dragged along by larger social forces outside their control. The effect of the human factor is that utopian social engineers inevitably are forced, despite themselves, to try to alter human nature itself in their bid to transform society. Their social plan “substitutes for [the social engineers’] demand that we build a new society, fit for men and women to live in, the demand that we ‘mould’ these men and women to fit into this new society” (Poverty of Historicism, 70).

Achieving such molding requires awesome and total power and thus in this way utopian engineering naturally tends toward the most severe authoritarian dictatorship. But this is not the only reason that utopian engineering and tyranny are allied. The central planning that it requires invariably concentrates power in the hands of the few, or even the one. This is why even utopian projects that officially embrace democracy tend towards authoritarianism. Authoritarian societies are in turn hostile to any public criticism, which deprives the planners of needed feedback about the impact of their policies, which further undermines the effectiveness of utopian engineering. In addition, Popper argued that the utopian planners’ historicism makes them indifferent to the misery that their plans cause. Having uncovered what they believe is inevitable en route to utopia, they all too easily countenance any suffering as a necessary part of that process, and, moreover, they will be inclined to see such suffering as outweighed by the benefits that will flow to all once utopia is reached.

Popper’s discussion of utopian engineering and its link to historicism is highly abstract. His criticisms are generally aimed at “typical” historicists and utopian planners, rather than actual historical or contemporary figures.  This reluctance to name names is somewhat surprising, given that Popper himself later stated that the political disasters of the 1930s and 40s were the impetus for his foray into political philosophy. Exactly whom did Popper think was guilty of social science malpractice? A contemporary reader with a passing familiarity with 20th-century history is bound to suppose that Popper had in mind the horrors of the Soviet Union when he discussed utopian planning. Indeed, the attempts to transform the Soviet Union into a modern society—the “five year plans,” rapid industrialization, collectivization of agriculture, and so forth—would seem to feature all the elements of utopian engineering. They were fueled by Marxist historicism and utopianism, centrally planned, aimed at wholesale remodeling of Russian society, and even sought to create a new type of person—“New Soviet Man”—through indoctrination and propaganda. Moreover, the utopian planning had precisely the pernicious effects that Popper predicted. The Soviet Union soon morphed into a brutal dictatorship under Stalin, criticism of the leadership and their programs was ruthlessly suppressed, and the various ambitious social projects were bedeviled by massive unintended consequences. The collectivization of agriculture, for instance, led to a precipitous drop in agricultural production and some 10 million deaths, partly from the unintended consequence of mass starvation and partly from the Soviet leaders’ piecemeal improvisation of murdering incorrigible peasants. However, when writing Poverty and The Open Society, Popper regarded the Soviet experiments, at least the early ones, as examples of piecemeal social planning rather than the utopian kind. His optimistic assessment is no doubt explained partly by his belief at the time that the Russian revolution was a progressive event, and he was thus reluctant to criticize the Soviet Union (Hacohen, 396-397). In any event, the full horrors of the Soviet social experiments were not yet known to the wider world. In addition, the Soviets during the Second World War were part of the alliance against fascism, which Popper saw as a much greater threat to humanity. In fact, initially Popper viewed totalitarianism as an exclusively right-wing phenomenon. However, he later became a unambiguous opponent of Soviet-style communism, and he dedicated the 1957 publication in book form of The Poverty of Historicism to the “memory of the countless men, women and children of all creeds or nations or races who fell victims to the fascist and communist belief in Inexorable Laws of Historical Destiny.”

2. Freedom, Democracy and the Open Society 

Having uncovered what he believed were the underlying psychological forces abetting totalitarianism (the strain of civilization) as well as the flawed philosophical ideas (historicism, holism and essentialism), Popper provided his own account of the values and institutions needed to sustain an open society in the contemporary world.  He viewed modern Western liberal democracies as open societies and defended them as “the best of all political worlds of whose existence we have any historical knowledge” (All Life Is Problem Solving, 90). For Popper, their value resided principally in the individual freedom that they permitted and their ability to self-correct peacefully over time. That they were democratic and generated great prosperity was merely an added benefit. What gives the concept of an open society its interest is not so much the originality of the political system that Popper advocated, but rather the novel grounds on which he developed and defended this political vision. Popper’s argument for a free and democratic society is anchored in a particular epistemology and understanding of the scientific method. He held that all knowledge, including knowledge of the social world, was conjectural and that freedom and social progress ultimately depended upon the scientific method, which is merely a refined and institutionalized process of trial and error.  Liberal democracies in a sense both embodied and fostered this understanding of knowledge and science.

a. Minimalist Democracy

Popper’s view of democracy was simple, though not simplistic, and minimalist. Rejecting the question Who should rule? as the fundamental question of political theory, Popper proposed a new question: “How can we so organize political institutions that bad or incompetent rulers can be prevented from doing too much damage?” (Open Society Vol. 1, 121). This is fundamentally a question of institutional design, Popper said. Democracy happens to be the best type of political system because it goes a long way toward solving this problem by providing a nonviolent, institutionalized and regular way to get rid of bad rulers—namely by voting them out of office. For Popper, the value of democracy did not reside in the fact that the people are sovereign. (And, in any event, he said, “the people do not rule anywhere, it is always governments that rule” [All Life Is Problem Solving, 93]). Rather, Popper defended democracy principally on pragmatic or empirical grounds, not on the “essentialist” view that democracy by definition is rule by the people or on the view that there is something intrinsically valuable about democratic participation. With this move, Popper is able to sidestep altogether a host of traditional questions of democratic theory, e.g.. On what grounds are the people sovereign? Who, exactly, shall count as “the people”? How shall they be represented? The role of the people is simply to provide a regular and nonviolent way to get rid of incompetent, corrupt or abusive leaders.

Popper devoted relatively little thought toward the design of the democratic institutions that permit people to remove their leaders or otherwise prevent them from doing too much harm. But he did emphasize the importance of instituting checks and balances into the political system. Democracies must seek “institutional control of the rulers by balancing their power against other powers” (Ibid.) This idea, which was a key component of the “new science” of politics in the 18th century, was expressed most famously by James Madison in Federalist Paper #51.  “A dependence on the people is, no doubt, the primary control on the government,” Madison wrote, “but experience has taught mankind the necessity of auxiliary precautions.” That is, government must be designed such that “ambition must be made to counteract ambition.” Popper also argued that two-party systems, such as found in the United States and Great Britain, are superior to proportional representation systems; he reasoned that in a two-party system voters are more easily able to assign failure or credit to a particular political party, that is, the one in power at the time of an election. This in turn fosters self-criticism in the defeated party: “Under such a system … parties are from time to time forced to learn from their mistakes” (All Life Is Problem Solving, 97). For these reasons, government in a two-party system better mirrors the trial-and-error process found in science, leading to better public policy. In contrast, Popper argued that proportional representation systems typically produce multiple parties and coalitional governments in which no single party has control of the government. This makes it difficult for voters to assign responsibility for public policy and thus elections are less meaningful and government less responsive. (It should be noted that Popper ignored that divided government is a typical outcome in the U.S. system. It is relevantly infrequent for one party to control the presidency along with both chambers of the U.S. congress, thus making it difficult for voters to determine responsibility for public policy successes and failures.)

Importantly, Popper’s theory of democracy did not rely upon a well-informed and judicious public. It did not even require that the public, though ill-informed, nonetheless exercises a kind of collective wisdom. In fact, Popper explicitly rejected vox populi vox dei as a “classical myth”. “We are democrats,” Popper wrote, “not because the majority is always right, but because democratic traditions are the least evil ones of which we know” (Conjectures and Refutations, 351). Better than any other system, democracies permit the change of government without bloodshed. Nonetheless Popper expressed the hope that public opinion and the institutions that influence it (universities, the press, political parties, cinema, television, and so forth) could become more rational overtime by embracing the scientific tradition of critical discussion—that is, the willingness to submit one’s ideas to public criticism and habit of listening to another person’s point of view.

b. Piecemeal Social Engineering

So the chief role of the citizen in Popper’s democracy is the small but important one of removing bad leaders. How then is public policy to be forged and implemented? Who forges it? What are its goals? Here Popper introduced the concept of “piecemeal social engineering,” which he offered as a superior approach to the utopian engineering described above. Unlike utopian engineering, piecemeal social engineering must be “small scale,” Popper said, meaning that social reform should focus on changing one institution at a time.  Also, whereas utopian engineering aims for lofty and abstract goals (for example, perfect justice, true equality, a higher kind of happiness), piecemeal social engineering seeks to address concrete social problems (for example, poverty, violence, unemployment, environmental degradation, income inequality). It does so through the creation of new social institutions or the redesign of existing ones. These new or reconfigured institutions are then tested through implementation and altered accordingly and continually in light of their effects. Institutions thus may undergo gradual improvement overtime and social ills gradually reduced. Popper compared piecemeal social engineering to physical engineering. Just as physical engineers refine machines through a series of small adjustments to existing models, social engineers gradually improve social institutions through “piecemeal tinkering.” In this way, “[t]he piecemeal method permits repeated experiments and continuous readjustments” (Open Society Vol 1., 163). Only such social experiments, Popper said, can yield reliable feedback for social planners. In contrast, as discussed above, social reform that is wide ranging, highly complex and involves multiple institutions will produce social experiments in which it is too difficult to untangle causes and effects.  The utopian planners suffer from a kind of hubris, falsely and tragically believing that they possess reliable experimental knowledge about how the social world operates.  But the “piecemeal engineer knows, like Socrates, how little he knows. He knows that we can learn only from our mistakes” (Poverty of Historicism, 67).

Thus, as with his defense of elections in a democracy, Popper’s argument for piecemeal social engineering rests principally on its compatibility with the trial-and-error method of the natural sciences: a theory is proposed and tested, errors in the theory are detected and eliminated, and a new, improved theory emerges, starting the cycle over. Via piecemeal engineering, the process of social progress thus parallels scientific progress. Indeed, Popper says that piecemeal social engineering is the only approach to public policy that can be genuinely scientific: “This—and no Utopian planning or historical prophecy—would mean the introduction of scientific method into politics, since the whole secret of scientific method is a readiness to learn from mistakes” (Open Society Vol 1., 163).

c. Negative Utilitarianism

If piecemeal social engineers should target specific social problems, what criteria should they use to determine which problems are most urgent? Here Popper introduced a concept that he dubbed “negative utilitarianism,” which holds that the principal aim of politics should be to reduce suffering rather than to increase happiness. “[I]t is my thesis,” he wrote, “that human misery is the most urgent problem of a rational public policy” (Conjectures and Refutations, 361). He made several arguments in favor of this view.

First, he claimed that there is no moral symmetry between suffering and happiness: “In my opinion … human suffering makes a direct moral appeal, namely, an appeal for help, while there is no similar call to increase the happiness of a man who is doing well anyway” (Open Society Vol. 1, 284). He added:

A further criticism of the Utilitarian formula ‘Maximize pleasure’ is that it assumes, in principle, a continuous pleasure-pain scale which allows us to treat degrees of pain as negative degrees of pleasure. But, from a moral point of view, pain cannot be outweighed by pleasure, and especially not one man’s pain by another man’s pleasure (Ibid.).

In arguing against what we might call “positive utilitarianism,” Popper stressed the dangers of utopianism. Attempts to increase happiness, especially when guided by some ideal of complete or perfect happiness, are bound to lead to perilous utopian political projects. “It leads invariably to the attempt to impose our scale of ‘higher’ values upon others, in order to make them realize what seems to us of greatest importance for their happiness; in order, as it were to save their souls. It leads to Utopianism and Romanticism” (Open Society Vol 11., 237).  In addition, such projects are dangerous because they tend to justify extreme measures, including severe human suffering in the present, as necessary measures to secure a much greater human happiness in the future. “[W]e must not argue that the misery of one generation may be considered as a mere means to the end of securing the lasting happiness of some later generation or generations” (Conjectures and Refutations, 362). Moreover, such projects are doomed to fail anyway, owing to the unintended consequences of social planning and the irreconcilability of the ultimate humans ends of freedom, equality, and happiness. Thus Popper’s rejection of positive utilitarianism becomes part of his broader critique of utopian social engineering, while his advocacy of negative utilitarianism is tied to his support for piecemeal social engineering. It is piecemeal engineering that provides the proper approach to tackling the identifiable, concrete sources of suffering in our world.

Finally, Popper offered the pragmatic argument that negative utilitarianism approach “adds to clarify the field of ethics” by requiring that “we formulate our demands negatively”  (Open Society Vol. 1, 285.). Properly understood, Popper says, the aim of science is “the elimination of false theories … rather than the attainment of established truths” (Ibid.). Similarly, ethical public policy may benefit by aiming at “the elimination of suffering rather than the promotion of happiness” (Ibid.). Popper thought that reducing suffering provides a clearer target for public policy than chasing after the will-o’-the-wisp, never-ending goal of increasing happiness. In addition, he argued, it easier to reach political agreement to combat suffering than to increase happiness, thus making effective public policy more likely. “For new ways of happiness are theoretical, unreal things, about which it may be difficult to form an opinion. But misery is with us, here and now, and it will be with us for a long time to come. We all know it from experience” (Conjectures and Refutations, 346). Popper thus calls for a public policy that aims at reducing and, hopefully, eliminating such readily identifiable and universally agreed upon sources of suffering as “poverty, unemployment, national oppression, war, and disease” (Conjectures and Refutations, 361).

d. Libertarian, Conservative or Social Democrat?

Popper’s political thought would seem to fit most comfortably within the liberal camp, broadly understood. Reason, toleration, nonviolence and individual freedom formed the core of his political values, and, as we have seen, he identified modern liberal democracies as the best-to-date embodiment of an open society. But where, precisely, did he reside within liberalism? Here Popper’s thought is difficult to categorize, as it includes elements of libertarianism, conservatism, and socialism—and, indeed, representatives from each of these schools have claimed him for their side.

The case for Popper’s libertarianism rests mainly on his emphasis on freedom and his hostility to large-scale central planning. He insisted that freedom—understood as individual freedom—is the most important political value and that efforts to impose equality can lead to tyranny. “Freedom is more important than equality,” he wrote, and “the attempt to realize equality endangers freedom” (Unended Quest, 36.) Popper also had great admiration for Friedrich Hayek, the libertarian economist from the so-called Austrian school, and he drew heavily upon his ideas in his critique of central planning. However, Popper also espoused many views that would be anathema to libertarians. Although he acknowledged “the tremendous benefit to be derived from the mechanism of free markets,” he seemed to regard economic freedom as important mainly for its instrumental role in producing wealth rather than as an important end in itself (Open Society Vol 11., 124). Further, he warned of the dangers of unbridled capitalism, even declaring that “the injustice and inhumanity of the unrestrained ‘capitalist system’ described by Marx cannot be questioned” (Ibid.). The state therefore must serve as a counteracting force against the predations of concentrated economic power: “We must construct social institutions, enforced by the power of the state, for the protection of the economically weak from the economically strong” (Open Society Vol 11., 125). This meant that the “principle of non-intervention, of an unrestrained economic system, has to be given up” and replaced by “economic interventionism” (Ibid.)  Such interventionism, which he also called “protectionism,” would be implemented via the piecemeal social engineering described above. This top-down and technocratic vision of politics is hard to reconcile with libertarianism, whose adherents, following Hayek, tend to believe that such social engineering is generally counterproductive, enlarges the power and thus the danger of the state, and violates individual freedom.

It is in this interventionist role for the state where the socialistic elements of Popper’s political theory are most evident. In his intellectual autobiography Unended Quest, Popper says that he was briefly a Marxist in his youth, but soon rejected the doctrine for what he saw as its adherents’ dogmatism and embrace of violence.  Socialism nonetheless remained appealing to him, and he remained a socialist for “several years” after abandoning Marxism (Unended Quest, 36). “For nothing could be better,” he wrote, “than living a modest, simple, and free life in an egalitarian society” (Ibid.). However, eventually he concluded that socialism was “no more than a beautiful dream,” and the dream is undone by the conflict between freedom and equality (Ibid.).

But though Popper saw utopian efforts to create true social and economic equality as dangerous and doomed to fail anyway, he continued to support efforts by the state to reduce and even eliminate the worst effects of capitalism. As we saw above, he advocated the use of piecemeal social engineering to tackle the problems of poverty, unemployment, disease and “rigid class differences.” And it is clear that for Popper the solutions to these problems need not be market-oriented solutions. For instance, he voiced support for establishing a minimum income for all citizens as a means to eliminate poverty. It seems then that his politics put into practice would produce a society more closely resembling the so-called social democracies of northern Europe, with their more generous social welfare programs and greater regulation of industry, than the United States, with its more laissez-faire capitalism and comparatively paltry social welfare programs. That said, it should be noted that in later editions of The Open Society, Popper grew somewhat more leery of direct state intervention to tackle social problems, preferring tinkering with the state’s legal framework, if possible, to address them. He reasoned that direct intervention by the state always empowers the state, which endangers freedom.

Evidence of Popper’s conservatism can be found in his opposition to radical change. His critique of utopian engineering at times seems to echo Edmund Burke’s critique of the French Revolution. Burke depicted the bloodletting of the Terror as an object lesson in the dangers of sweeping aside all institutions and traditions overnight and replacing them with an abstract and untested social blueprint. Also like Burke and other traditional conservatives, Popper emphasized the importance of tradition for ensuring order, stability and well-functioning institutions. People have an inherent need for regularity and thus predictability in their social environment, Popper argued, which tradition is crucial for providing. However, there are important differences between Popper’s and Burke’s understanding of tradition. Popper included Burke, as well as the influential 20th-century conservative Michael Oakeshott, in the camp of the “anti-rationalists.” This is because “their attitude is to accept tradition as something just given”; that is, they “accept tradition uncritically” (Conjectures and Refutations, 120, 122, Popper’s emphasis). Such an attitude treats the values, beliefs and practices of a particular tradition as “taboo.” Popper, in contrast, advocated a “critical attitude” toward tradition (Ibid., Popper’s emphasis). “We free ourselves from the taboo if we think about it, and if we ask ourselves whether we should accept it or reject” (Ibid.). Popper emphasized that a critical attitude does not require stepping outside of all traditions, something Popper denied was possible. Just as criticism in the sciences always targets particular theories and also always takes place from the standpoint of some theory, so to for social criticism with respect to tradition. Social criticism necessarily focuses on particular traditions and does so from the standpoint of a tradition. In fact, the critical attitude toward tradition is itself a tradition -- namely the scientific tradition -- that dates back to the ancient Greeks of the 5th and 6th century B.C.E.

Popper’s theory of democracy also arguably contained conservative elements insofar as it required only a limited role for the average citizen in governing.  As we saw above, the primary role of the public in Popper’s democracy is to render a verdict on the success or failure of a government’s policies. For Popper public policy is not to be created through the kind of inclusive public deliberation envisioned by advocates of radical or participatory democracy. Much less is it to be implemented by ordinary citizens. Popper summed up his view by quoting Pericles, the celebrated statesman of Athenian democracy in 5th-century B.C.E.: “’Even if only a few of us are capable of devising a policy or putting it into practice, all of us are capable of judging it’.” Popper added, “Please note that [this view] discounts the notion of rule by the people, and even of popular initiative. Both are replaced with the very different idea of judgement by the people” (Lessons of This Century, 72, Popper’s emphasis). This view in some ways mirrors traditional conservatives’ support for rule by “natural aristocrats,” as Burke called them, in a democratic society. Ideally, elected officials would be drawn from the class of educated gentlemen, who would be best fit to hold positions of leadership owing to their superior character, judgment and experience.  However, in Popper’s system, good public policy in a democracy would result not so much from the superior wisdom or character of its leadership but rather from their commitment to the scientific method. As discussed above, this entailed implementing policy changes in a piecemeal fashion and testing them through the process of trial and error. Popper’s open society is technocratic rather than aristocratic.

3. References and Further Reading

The key texts for Popper’s political thought are The Open Society and Its Enemies (1945) and The Poverty of Historicism (1944/45). Popper continued to write and speak about politics until his death in 1994, but his later work was mostly refinement of the ideas that he developed in those two seminal essays.  Much of that refinement is contained in Conjectures and Refutations (1963), a collection of essays and addresses from the 1940s and 50s that includes in-depth discussions of public opinion, tradition and liberalism. These and other books and essay collections by Popper that include sustained engagement with political theory are listed below:

a. Primary Literature

  • Popper, Karl. 1945/1966. The Open Society and Its Enemies, Vol. 1, Fifth Edition. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Popper, Karl. 1945/1966. The Open Society and Its Enemies, Vol. I1, Fifth Edition. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Popper, Karl.1957. The Poverty of Historicism. London: Routledge.
    • A revised version of “The Poverty of Historicism,” first published in the journal Economica in three parts in 1944 and 1945.
  • Popper, Karl. 1963/1989. Conjectures and Refutations. Fifth Edition. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Popper, Karl. 1976. Unended Quest. London: Open Court.
    • Popper’s intellectual autobiography.
  • Popper, Karl.1985. Popper Selections. David Miller (ed.). Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • Contains excerpts from The Open Society and The Poverty of Historicism, as well as a few other essays on politics and history.
  • Popper, Karl. 1994. In Search of a Better World. London: Routledge.
    • Parts II and III contain, respectively, essays on the role of culture clash in the emergence of open societies and the responsibility of intellectuals.
  • Popper, Karl. 1999. All Life Is Problem Solving. London: Routledge.
    • Part II of this volume contains essays and speeches on history and politics, mostly from the 1980s and 90s.
  • Popper, Karl. 2000. The Lessons of This Century. London: Routledge.
    • A collection of interviews with Popper, dating from 1991 and 1993, on politics, plus two addresses from late1980s on democracy, freedom and intellectual responsibility.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Bambrough, Renford. (ed.). 1967. Plato, Popper, and Politics: Some Contributions to a Modern Controversy. New York: Barnes and Noble
    • Contains essays addressing Popper’s controversial interpretation of Plato.
  • Corvi, Roberta. 1997. An Introduction to the Thought of Karl Popper. London: Routledge.
    • Emphasizes connections between Popper’s epistemological, metaphysical and political works.
  • Currie, Gregory, and Alan Musgrave (eds.). 1985. Popper and the Human Sciences. Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff Plublishers.
    • Essays on Popper’s contribution to the philosophy of social science.
  • Frederic, Raphael. 1999. Popper. New York: Routledge.
    • This short monograph offers a lively, sympathetic but critical tour through Popper’s critique of historicism and utopian planning.
  • Hacohen, Malachi Haim. 2000. Karl Popper: The Formative Years, 1902-1945. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • This definitive and exhaustive biography of the young Popper unveils the historical origins of his thought.
  • Jarvie, Ian and Sandra Pralong (eds.). 1999. Popper’s Open Society after 50 Years. London: Routledge.
    • A collection of essays exploring and critiquing key ideas of The Open Society and applying them to contemporary political problems.
  • Magee, Brian. 1973. Popper. London: Fontana/Collins.
    • A brief and accessible introduction to Popper’s philosophy.
  • Notturno, Mark. 2000. Science and Open Society. New York: Central European University Press.
    • Examines connections between Popper’s anti-inductivism and anti-positivism and his social and political values, including opposition to institutionalized science, intellectual authority and communism.
  • Schilp, P.A. (ed.) 1974. The Philosophy of Karl Popper. 2 vols. La Salle, IL: Open Court.
    • Essays by various authors that explore and critique his philosophy, including his political thought. Popper’s replies to the essays are included.
  • Shearmur, Jeremey. 1995. The Political Thought of Karl Popper. London: Routledge.
    • Argues that the logic of Popper’s own ideas should have made him more leery of state intervention and more receptive to classical liberalism.
  • Stokes, Geoffrey. 1998. Popper: Philosophy, Politics and Scientific Method. Cambridge: Polity Press.
    • Argues that we need to consider Popper’s political values to understand the unity of his philosophy.


Author Information

William Gorton
Email: bill_gorton@msn.com
Alma College
U. S. A.

The Computational Theory of Mind

The Computational Theory of Mind (CTM) claims that the mind is a computer, so the theory is also known as computationalism. It is generally assumed that CTM is the main working hypothesis of cognitive science.

CTM is often understood as a specific variant of the Representational Theory of Mind (RTM), which claims that cognition is manipulation of representation. The most popular variant of CTM, classical CTM, or simply CTM without any qualification, is related to the Language of Thought Hypothesis (LOTH), that has been forcefully defended by Jerry Fodor. However, there are several other computational accounts of the mind that either reject LOTH—notably connectionism and several accounts in contemporary computational neuroscience—or do not subscribe to RTM at all. In addition, some authors explicitly disentangle the question of whether the mind is computational from the question of whether it manipulates representations. It seems that there is no inconsistency in maintaining that cognition requires computation without subscribing to representationalism, although most proponents of CTM agree that the account of cognition in terms of computation over representation is the most cogent. (But this need not mean that representation is reducible to computation.)

One of the basic philosophical arguments for CTM is that it can make clear how thought and content are causally relevant in the physical world. It does this by saying thoughts are syntactic entities that are computed over: their form makes them causally relevant in just the same way that the form makes fragments of source code in a computer causally relevant. This basic argument may be made more specific in various ways. For example, Allen Newell couched it in terms of the physical symbol hypothesis, according to which being a physical symbol system (a physical computer) is a necessary and sufficient condition of thinking. Haugeland framed the claim in formalist terms: if you take care of the syntax, the semantics will take care of itself. Daniel Dennett, in a slightly different vein, claims that while semantic engines are impossible, syntactic engines can approximate them quite satisfactorily.

This article focuses only on specific problems with the Computation Theory of Mind (CTM), while for the most part leaving RTM aside. There are four main sections. In the first section, the three most important variants of CTM are introduced: classical CTM, connectionism, and computational neuroscience. The second section discusses the most important conceptions of computational explanation in cognitive science, which are functionalism and mechanism. The third section introduces the skeptical arguments against CTM raised by Hilary Putnam, and presents several accounts of implementation (or physical realization) of computation. Common objections to CTM are listed in the fourth section.

Table of Contents

  1. Variants of Computationalism
    1. Classical CTM
    2. Connectionism
    3. Computational Neuroscience
  2. Computational Explanation
    1. Functionalism
    2. Mechanism
  3. Implementation
    1. Putnam and Searle against CTM
    2. Semantic Account
    3. Causal Account
    4. Mechanistic Account
  4. Other objections to CTM
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Variants of Computationalism

The generic claim that the mind is a computer may be understood in various ways, depending on how the basic terms are understood. In particular, some theorists claimed that only cognition is computation, while emotional processes are not computational (Harnish 2002, 6), yet some theorists explain neither motor nor sensory processes in computational terms (Newell and Simon 1972). These differences are relatively minor compared to the variety of ways in which “computation” is understood.

The main question here is just how much of the mind’s functioning is computational. The crux of this question comes with trying to understand exactly what computation is. In its most generic reading, computation is equated with information processing; but in stronger versions, it is explicated in terms of digital effective computation, which is assumed in the classical version of CTM; in some other versions, analog or hybrid computation is admissible. Although Alan Turing defined effective computation using his notion of a machine (later called a ‘Turing machine’, see below section 1.a), there is a lively debate in philosophy of mathematics as to whether all physical computation is Turing-equivalent. Even if all mathematical theories of effective computation that we know of right now (for example, lambda calculus, Markoff algorithms, and partial recursive functions) turn out to be equivalent to Turing-machine computation, it is an open question whether they are adequate formalizations of the intuitive notion of computation. Some theorists, for example, claim that it is physically possible that hypercomputational processes (that is, processes that compute functions that a Turing machine cannot compute) exist (Copeland 2004). For this reason, the assumption that CTM has to assume Turing computation, frequently made in the debates over computationalism, is controversial.

One can distinguish several basic kinds of computation, such as digital, analog, and hybrid. As they are traditionally assumed in the most popular variants of CTM, they will be explicated in the following format: classical CTM assumes digital computation; connectionism may also involve analog computation; and in several theories in computational neuroscience, hybrid analog/digital processing is assumed.

a. Classical CTM

Classical CTM is understood as the conjunction of RTM (and, in particular, LOTH) and the claim that cognition is digital effective computation. The best-known account of digital, effective computation was given by Alan Turing in terms of abstract machines (which were originally intended to be conceptual tools rather than physical entities, though sometimes they are built physically simply for fun). Such abstract machines can only do what a human computer would do mechanically, given a potentially indefinite amount of paper, a pencil, and a list of rote rules. More specifically, a Turing machine (TM) has at least one tape, on which symbols from a finite alphabet can appear; the tape is read and written (and erased) by a machine head, and can also move left or right. The functioning of the machine is described by the machine table instructions, which  include five pieces of information: (1) the current state of the TM; (2) the symbol read from the tape; (3) the symbol written on the tape; (4) left or right movement of the head; (5) the next state of the TM. The machine table has to be finite; the number of states is also finite. In contrast, the length of tape is potentially unbounded.

As it turns out, all known effective (that is, halting, or necessarily ending their functioning with the expected result) algorithms can be encoded as a list of instructions for a Turing machine. For  example, a basic Turing machine can be built to perform logical negation of the input propositional letter. The alphabet may consist of all 26 Latin letters, a blank symbol and a tilde. Now, the machine table instructions need to specify the following operations: if the head scanner is at the tilde, erase the tilde (this effectively realizes the double negation rule); if the head scanner is at the letter and the state of the machine is not “1”, move the head left and change the state of the machine to 1; if the state is “1” and the head is at the blank symbol, write the tilde (note: This list of instructions is vastly simplified for presentation purposes. In reality, it would be necessary to rewrite symbols on the tape when inserting the tilde and decide when to stop operation. B—ased on the current list, it would simply cycle infinitely). Writing Turing machine programs is actually rather time-consuming and useful only for purely theoretical purposes, but all other digital effective computational formalisms are essentially similar in requiring  (1) a finite number of different symbols in what corresponds to a Turing machine alphabet (digitality); (2) that there are a finite number of steps from the beginning to the end of operation (effectiveness). (Correspondingly, one can introduce hypercomputation by positing an infinite number of symbols in the alphabet, infinite number of states or steps in the operation, or by introducing randomness in the execution of operations.) Note that digitality is not equivalent to binary code, it is just technologically easier to produce physical systems responsive to two states rather than ten. Early computers operated, for example, on decimal code, rather than binary code (Von Neumann 1958).

There is a particularly important variant of the Turing machine, which played a seminal role in justifying the CTM. This is the universal Turing machine. A Turing machine is a formally defined, mathematical entity. Hence, it has a unique description, which can identify a given TM. Since we can encode these descriptions on the tape of another TM, they can be operated upon, and one can make these operations conform to the definition of the first TM. This way, a TM that has the encoding of any other TM on its input tape will act accordingly, and will faithfully simulate the other TM. This machine  is then called universal. The notion of universality is very important in the mathematical theory of computability, as the universal TM is hypothesized to be able to compute all effectively computable mathematical functions. In addition, the idea of using a description of a TM to determine the functioning of another TM gave rise to the idea of programmable computers. At the same time, flexibility is supposed to be the hallmark of general intelligence, and many theorists supposed that this flexibility can be explained with universality (Newell 1980). This gave the universal TM a special role in the CTM; one that motivated an analogy between the mind and the computer: both were supposed to solve problems whose nature cannot be exactly predicted (Apter 1970).

These points notwithstanding, the analogy between the universal TM and the mind is not necessary to prove classical CTM true. For example, it may turn out that human memory is essentially much more bounded than the tape of the TM. In addition, the significance of the TM in modeling cognition is not obvious: the universal TM was never used directly to write computational models of cognitive tasks, and its role may be seen as merely instrumental in analyzing the computational complexity of algorithms posited to explain these tasks. Some theorists question whether anything at all hinges upon the notion of equivalence between the mind’s information-processing capabilities and the Turing machine (Sloman 1996) ——the CTM may leave the question whether all physical computation is Turing-equivalent open, or it might even embrace hypercomputation.

The first digital model of the mind was (probably) presented by Warren McCulloch and Walter Pitts (1943), who suggested that the brain’s neuron operation essentially corresponds to logical connectives (in other words, neurons were equated with what later was called ‘logical gates’ —the basic building blocks of contemporary digital integrated circuits). In philosophy, the first avowal of CTM is usually linked with Hilary Putnam (1960), even if the latter paper does not explicitly assert that the mind is equivalent to a Turing machine but rather uses the concept to defend his functionalism. The classical CTM also became influential in early cognitive science (Miller, Galanter, and Pribram 1967).

In 1975, Jerry Fodor linked CTM with LOTH. He argued that cognitive representations are tokens of the Language of Thought and that the mind is a digital computer that operates on these tokens. Fodor’s forceful defense of LOTH and CTM as inextricably linked prompted many cognitive scientists and philosophers to equate LOTH and CTM. In Fodor’s version, CTM furnishes psychology with the proper means for dealing with the question of how thought, framed in terms of propositional attitudes, is possible. Propositional attitudes are understood as relations of the cognitive agent to the tokens in its LOT, and the operations on these tokens are syntactic, or computational. In other words, the symbols of LOT are transformed by computational rules, which are usually supposed to be inferential. For this reason, classical CTM is also dubbed symbolic CTM, and the existence of symbol transformation rules is supposed to be a feature of this approach. However, the very notion of the symbol is used differently by various authors: some mean entities equivalent to symbols on the tape of the TM, some think of physically distinguishable states, as in Newell’s physical symbol hypothesis (Newell’s symbols, roughly speaking, point to the values of some variables), whereas others frame them as tokens in LOT. For this reason, major confusion over the notion of symbol is prevalent in current debate (Steels 2008).

The most compelling case for classical CTM can be made by showing its aptitude for dealing with abstract thinking, rational reasoning, and language processing. For example, Fodor argued that productivity of language (the capacity to produce indefinitely many different sentences) can be explained only with compositionality, and compositionality is a feature of rich symbol systems, similar to natural language. (Another argument is related to systematicity; see (Aizawa 2003).) Classical systems, such as production systems, excel in simulating human performance in logical and mathematical domains. Production systems contain production rules, which are, roughly speaking, rules of the form “if a condition X is satisfied, do Y”. Usually there are thousands of concurrently active rules in production systems (for more information on production systems, see (Newell 1990; Anderson 1983).)

In his later writings, however, Fodor (2001) argued that only peripheral (that is, mostly perceptual and modular) processes are computational, in contradistinction to central cognitive processes, which, owing to their holism, cannot be explained computationally (or in any other way, really). This pessimism about classical CTM seems to contrast with the successes of the classical approach in its traditional domains.

Classical CTM is silent about the neural realization of symbol systems, and for this reason it has been criticized by connectionists as biologically implausible. For example, Miller et al. (1967) supposed that there is a specific cognitive level which is best described as corresponding to reasoning and thinking, rather than to any lower-level neural processing. Similar claims have been framed in terms of an analogy between the software/hardware distinction and the mind/brain distinction. Critics stress that the analogy is relatively weak, and neurally quite implausible. In addition, perceptual and motor functioning does not seem to fit the symbolic paradigm of cognitive science.

b. Connectionism

In contrast to classical CTM, connectionism is usually presented as a more biologically plausible variant of computation. Although some artificial neural networks (ANNs) are vastly idealized (for an evaluation of neural plausibility of typical ANNs, see (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2002, sec. 2.3)), many researchers consider them to be much more realistic than rule-based production systems. The connectionist systems do well in modeling perceptual and motor processes, which are much harder to model symbolically.

Some early ANNs are clearly digital (for example, the early proposal of McCulloch and Pitts, see section 1.a above, is both a neural network and a digital system), while some modern networks are supposed to be analog. In particular, the connection weights are continuous values, and even if these networks are usually simulated on digital computers, they are supposed to implement analog computation. Here an interesting epistemological problem is evident: because all measurement is of finite precision, we cannot ever be sure whether the measured value is actually continuous or discrete. The discreteness may just be a feature of the measuring apparatus. For this reason, continuous values are always theoretically posited rather than empirically discovered, as there is no way to empirically decide whether a given value is actually discrete or not. Having said that, there might be compelling reasons in some domains of science to assume that measurement values should be mathematically described as real numbers, rather than approximated digitally. (Note that a Turing machine cannot compute all real numbers but it can approximate any given real number to any desired degree, as the Nyquist-Shannon sampling theorem shows).

Importantly, the relationship between connectionism and RTM is more debatable here than in classical CTM. Some proponents of connectionist models are anti-representationalists or eliminativists: the notion of representation, according to them, can be discarded in connectionist cognitive science. Others claim that the mention of representation in connectionism is at best honorific (for an extended argument, see (Ramsey 2007)). Nevertheless, the position that connectionist networks are representational as a whole, by being homomorphic to their subject domain, has been forcefully defended (O’Brien and Opie 2006; O’Brien and Opie 2009). It seems that there are important and serious differences among various connectionist models in the way that they explain cognition.

In simpler models, the nodes of artificial neural networks may be treated as atomic representations (for example, as individual concepts). They are usually called ‘symbolic’ for that very reason. However, these representations represent only by fiat: it is the modeler who decides what they represent. For this reason, they do not seem to be biologically plausible, though some might argue that, at least in principle, individual neurons may represent complex features: in biological brains, so-called grandmother cells do exactly that (Bowers 2009; Gross 2002; Konorski 1967). More complex connectionist models do not represent individual representations as individual nodes; instead, the representation is distributed into multiple nodes that may be activated to a different degree. These models may plausibly implement the prototype theory of concepts (Wittgenstein 1953; Rosch and Mervis 1975). The distributed representation seems, therefore, to be much more biologically and psychologically plausible for proponents of the prototype theory (though this theory is also debated ——see (Machery 2009) for a critical review of theories of concepts in psychology).

The proponents of classical CTM have objected to connectionism by pointing out that distributed representations do not seem to explain productivity and systematicity of cognition, as these representations are not compositional (Fodor and Pylyshyn 1988). Fodor and Pylyshyn present connectionists with the following dilemma: If representations in ANNs are compositional, then ANNs are mere implementations of classical systems; if not, they are not plausible models of higher cognition. Obviously, both horns of the dilemma are unattractive for connectionism. This has sparked a lively debate. (For a review, see Connectionism and (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2002, chap. 6)). In short, some reject the premise that higher cognition is actually as systematic and productive as Fodor and Pylyshyn assume, while others defend the view that implementing a compositional symbolic system by an ANN does not simply render it uninteresting technical gadgetry, because further aspects of cognitive processes can be explained this way.

In contemporary cognitive modeling, ANNs have become major standard tools. (See for example (Lewandowsky and Farrell 2011)). They are also prevalent in computational neuroscience, but there are some important hybrid digital/analog systems in the latter discipline that deserve separate treatment.

c. Computational Neuroscience

Computational neuroscience employs many diverse methods and it is hard to find modeling techniques applicable to a wide range of task domains. Yet it has been argued that, in general, computation in the brain is neither completely analog nor completely digital (Piccinini and Bahar 2013). This is because neurons, on one hand, seem to be digital, since they spike only when the input signal exceeds a certain threshold (hence, the continuous input value becomes discrete), but their spiking forms continuous patterns in time. For this reason, it is customary to describe the functioning of spiking neurons both as dynamical systems, which means that they are represented in terms of continuous parameters evolving in time in a multi-dimensional space (the mathematical representation takes the form of differential equations in this case), and as networks of information-processing elements (usually in a way similar to connectionism). Hybrid analog/digital systems are also often postulated as situated in different parts of the brain. For example, the prefrontal cortex is said to manifest bi-stable behavior and gating (O’Reilly 2006), which is typical of digital systems.

Unifying frameworks in computational neuroscience are relatively rare. Of special interest might be the Bayesian brain theory and the Neural Engineering Framework (Eliasmith and Anderson 2003). The Bayesian brain theory has become one of the major theories of brain functioning——here it is assumed that the brain’s main function is to predict probable outcomes (for example, causes of sensory stimulation) based on its earlier sensory input. One major theory of this kind is the free-energy theory (Friston, Kilner, and Harrison 2006; Friston and Kiebel 2011). This theory presupposes that the brain uses hierarchical predictive coding, which is an efficient way to deal with probabilistic reasoning (which is known to be computationally hard; this is one of the major criticisms of this approach ——it may even turn out that predictive coding is not Bayesian at all, compare (Blokpoel, Kwisthout, and Van Rooij 2012)). The predictive coding (also called predictive processing) is thought by Andy Clark to be a unifying theory of the brain (Clark 2013), where brains predict future (or causes of) sensory input in a top-down fashion and minimize the error of such predictions either by changing predictions about sensory input or by acting upon the world. However, as critics of this line of research have noted, such predictive coding models lack plausible neural implementation (usually they lack any implementation and remain sketchy, compare (Rasmussen and Eliasmith 2013)). Some suggest that a lack of implementation is true of the Bayesian models in general (Jones and Love 2011).

The Neural Engineering Framework (NEF) differs from the predictive brain approach in two respects: it does not posit a single function for the brain, and it offers detailed, biologically-plausible models of cognitive capacities. In a recent version (Eliasmith 2013) features the world’s largest functional brain model. The main principles of the NEF are: (1) Neural representations are understood as combinations of nonlinear encoding and optimal linear decoding (this includes temporal and population representations); (2) transformations of neural representations are functions of variables represented by a population; and (3) neural dynamics are described with neural representations as control-theoretic state variables. (‘Transformation’ is the term given for what would traditionally be called computation.) The NEF models are at the same time representational, computational, dynamical, and use the control theory (which is mathematically equivalent to dynamic systems theory). Of special interest is that the NEF enables the building of plausible architectures that tackle symbolic problems. For example, a 2.5-million neuron model of the brain (called ‘Spaun’) has been built, which is able to perform eight diverse tasks (Eliasmith et al. 2012). Spaun features so-called semantic pointers, which can be seen as elements of compressed neural vector space, and which enable the execution of higher cognition tasks. At the same time, the NEF models are usually less idealizing than classical CTM models, and they do not presuppose that the brain is as systematic and compositional as Fodor and Pylyshyn claim. The NEF models deliver the required performance but without positing an architecture that is entirely reducible to a classical production system.

2. Computational Explanation

The main aim of computational modeling in cognitive science is to explain and predict mental phenomena. (In neuroscience and psychiatry, therapeutic intervention is another major aim of the inquiry.) There are two main competing theories of computational explanation: functionalism, in particular David Marr’s account; and mechanism. Although some argue for the Deductive-Nomological account in cognitive science, especially proponents of dynamicism (Walmsley 2008), the dynamical models in question are contrasted with computational ones. What's more, the relation between mechanical and dynamical explanation is a matter of a lively debate (Zednik 2011; Kaplan and Craver 2011; Kaplan and Bechtel 2011).

a. Functionalism

One of the most prominent views of functional explanation (for a general overview see Causal Theories of Functional Explanation) was developed by Robert Cummins (Cummins 1975; Cummins 1983; Cummins 2000). Cummins rejects the idea that explanation in psychology is subsumption under a law. For him, psychology and other special sciences are interested in various effects, understood as exercises of various capacities. A given capacity is to be analyzed functionally, by decomposing it into a number of less problematic capacities, or dispositions, that jointly manifest themselves as the effect in question. In cognitive science and psychology, this joint manifestation is best understood in terms of flowcharts or computer programs. Cummins claims that computational explanations are just top-down explanations of a system’s capacity.

A specific problem with Cummins’ account is that the explanation is considered to be correct if dispositions are merely sufficient for the joint manifestation of the effect to be displayed. For example, a computer program that has the same output as a human subject, given the same input, is held to be explanatory of the subject’s performance. This seems problematic, given that computer simulations have been traditionally evaluated not only at the level of their inputs and outputs (in which case they would be merely ‘weakly equivalent’ in Fodor’s terminology, see (Fodor 1968)), but also at the level of the process that transforms the input data into the output data (in which case they are ‘strongly equivalent’ and genuinely explanatory, according to Fodor). Note, for example, that it is sufficient to kill U. S. President John F. Kennedy with an atomic bomb, but this fact is not explanatory of his actual assassination. In short, critics of functional explanation stress that it is too liberal and that it should require causal relevance as well. They argue that functional analyses devoid of causal relevance are in the best case incomplete, and in the worst case they may be explanatorily irrelevant (Piccinini and Craver 2011).

One way to make the functional account more robust is to introduce a hierarchy of explanatory levels. In the context of cognitive science, the most influential proposal for such a hierarchy comes from David Marr (1982), who proposes a three-leveled model of explanation. This model introduces several additional constraints that have since been widely accepted in modeling practice. In particular, Marr argued that the complete explanation of a computational system should feature the following levels: (1) The computational level; (2) the level of representation and algorithm; and (3) the level of hardware implementation.

At the computational level, the modeler is supposed to ask what operations the system performs and why it performs them. Interestingly, the term Marr proposed for this level has proved confusing to some. For this reason, it is usually characterized in semantic terms, such as knowledge or representation, but this may be also somewhat misleading. At this level, the modeler is supposed to assume that a device performs a task by carrying out a series of operations. She needs to identify the task in question and justify her explanatory strategy by ensuring that her specification mirrors the performance of the machine, and that the performance is appropriate in the given environment. Marrian “computation” refers to computational tasks and not to the manipulation of particular semantic representations. No wonder that other terms for this level have been put forth to prevent misunderstanding, perhaps the most appropriate of which is Sterelny’s (1990) “ecological level.” Sterelny makes it clear that the justification of why the task is performed includes the relevant physical conditions of the machine’s environment.

The level of representation and algorithm concerns the following questions: How can the computational task be performed? What is the representation of the input and output? And what is the algorithm for the transformation? The focus is on the formal features of the representation———which are required to develop an algorithm in a programming language —rather than on whether the inputs really represent anything. The algorithm is correct when it performs the specified task, given the same input as the computational system in question. The distinction between the computational level and the level of representation and algorithm amounts to the difference between what and how (Marr 1982, 28).

The level of hardware implementation refers to the physical machinery realizing the computation; in neuroscience, of course, this will be the brain. Marr’s methodological account is based on his own modeling in computational neuroscience, but stresses the relative autonomy of the levels, which are also levels of realization. There are multiple realizations of a given task (see Mind and Multiple Realizability), so Marr endorses the classical functionalist claim of relative autonomy of levels, which is supposed to underwrite antireductionism (Fodor 1974). Most functionalists subsequently embraced Marr’s levels as well (for example, Zenon Pylyshyn (1984) and Daniel Dennett (1987)).

Although Marr introduces more constraints than Cummins, because he requires the description of three different levels of realization, his theory also suffers from the abovementioned problems. That is, it does not require the causal relevance of the algorithm and representation level; sufficiency is all that is required. Moreover, it remains relatively unclear why exactly there are three, and not, say, five levels in the proper explanation (note that some philosophers proposed the introduction of intermediary levels). For these reasons, mechanists have criticized Marr’s approach (Miłkowski 2013).

b. Mechanism

According to mechanism, to explain a phenomenon is to explain its underlying mechanism. Mechanistic explanation is a species of causal explanation, and explaining a mechanism involves the discovery of its causal structure. While mechanisms are defined variously, the core idea is that they are organized systems, comprising causally relevant component parts and operations (or activities) thereof (Bechtel 2008; Craver 2007; Glennan 2002; Machamer, Darden, and Craver 2000). Parts of the mechanism interact and their orchestrated operation contributes to the capacity of the mechanism. Mechanistic explanations abound in special sciences, and it is hoped that an adequate description of the principles implied in explanations (those that are generally accepted as sound) will also furnish researchers with normative guidance. The idea that computational explanation is best understood as mechanistic has been defended by (Piccinini 2007b; Piccinini 2008) and (Miłkowski 2013). It is closely linked to causal accounts of computational explanation, too (Chalmers 2011).

Constitutive mechanistic explanation is the dominant form of computational explanation in cognitive science. This kind of explanation includes at least three levels of mechanism: a constitutive (-1) level, which is the lowest level in the given analysis; an isolated (0) level, where the parts of the mechanism are specified, along with their interactions (activities or operations); and the contextual (+1) level, where the function of the mechanism is seen in a broader context (for example, the context for human vision includes lighting conditions). In contrast to how Marr (1982) or Dennett (1987) understand them, levels here are not just levels of abstraction; they are levels of composition. They are tightly integrated, but not entirely reducible to the lowest level.

Computational models explain how the computational capacity of a mechanism is generated by the orchestrated operation of its component parts. To say that a mechanism implements a computation is to claim that the causal organization of the mechanism is such that the input and output information streams are causally linked and that this link, along with the specific structure of information processing, is completely described. Note that the link is sometimes cyclical and can be very complex.

In some respects, the mechanistic account of computational explanation may be viewed as a causally-constrained version of functional explanation. Developments in the theory of mechanistic explanation, which is now one of the most active fields in the philosophy of science, make it, however, much more sensitive to the actual scientific practice of modelers.

3. Implementation

One of the most difficult questions for proponents of CTM is how to determine whether a given physical system is an implementation of a formal computation. Note that computer science does not offer any theory of implementation, and the intuitive view that one can decide whether a system implements a computation by finding a one-to-one correspondence between physical states and the states of a computation may lead to serious problems. In what follows, I will sketch out some objections to the objectivity of the notion of computation, formulated by John Searle and Hilary Putnam, and examine various answers to their objections.

a. Putnam and Searle against CTM

Putnam and Searle’s objection may be summarized as follows. There is nothing objective about physical computation; computation is ascribed to physical systems by human observers merely for convenience. For this reason, there are no genuine computational explanations. Needless to say, such an objection invalidates most research that has been done in cognitive science.

In particular, Putnam (1991, 121–125) has constructed a proof that any open physical system implements any finite automaton (which is a model of computation that has lower computational power than a Turing machine; note that the proof can be easily extended to Turing machines as well). The purpose of Putnam’s argument is to demonstrate that functionalism, were it true, would imply behaviorism; for functionalism, the internal structure is completely irrelevant to deciding what function is actually realized. The idea of the proof is as follows. Any physical system has at least one state. This state obtains for some time, and the duration can be measured by an external clock. By an appeal to the clock, one can identify as many states as one wishes, especially if the states can be constructed by set-theoretic operations (or their logical equivalent, which is the disjunction operator). For this reason, one can always find as many states in the physical system as the finite machine requires (it has, after all, a finite number of states). Also, its evolution in time may be easily mapped onto a physical system thanks to disjunctions and the clock. For this reason, there is nothing explanatory about the notion of computation.

Searle’s argument is similar. He argues that being a digital computer is a matter of ascribing 0s and 1s to a physical system, and that for any program and any sufficiently complex object there is a description of the object under which it realizes the program (Searle 1992, 207–208). On this view, even an ordinary wall would be a computer. In essence, both objections are similar in making the point that given enough freedom, one can always map physical states —whose number can be adjusted by logical means or by simply making more measurements —to the formal system. If we talk of both systems in terms of sets, then all that matters is cardinality of both sets (in essence, these arguments are similar to the objection once made against Russell’s structuralism, compare (Newman 1928)). As the arguments are similar, the replies to these objections usually address both at the same time, and try to limit the admissible ways of carving physical reality. The view is that somehow reality should be carved at its joints, and then made to correspond with the formal model.

b. Semantic Account

The semantic account of implementation is by far the most popular among philosophers. It simply requires that there is no computation without representation (Fodor 1975). But the semantic account seems to beg the question, given that some computational models require no representation, notably in connectionism. Besides, other objections to CTM (in particular the arguments based on the Chinese Room experiment question the assumption that computer programs ever represent anything by themselves. For this reason, at least in this debate, one can only assume that programs represent just because they are ascribed meaning by external observers. But in such a case, the observer may just as easily ascribe meaning to a wall. Thus, the semantic account has no resources to deal with these objections.

I do not meant to suggest that the semantic account is completely wrong; indeed, the intuitive appeal of CTM is based on its close links with RTM. Yet the assumption that computation always represents has been repeatedly questioned (Fresco 2010; Piccinini 2006; Miłkowski 2013). For example, it seems that an ordinary logical gate (the computational entity that corresponds to a logical connective), for example an AND gate, does not represent anything. At least, it does not seem to refer to anything. Yet it is a simple computational device.

c. Causal Account

The causal account requires that the physical states taken to correspond to the mathematical description of computation are causally linked (Chalmers 2011). This means that there have to be counterfactual dependencies to satisfy (this requirement has been proposed by (Copeland 1996), but without requiring that the states be causally relevant) and that the methodological principles of causal explanations have to be followed. They include theoretical parsimony (used already by Fodor in his constraints of his semantic account of computation) and the causal Markov condition. In particular, states that are not related causally, be it in Searle’s wall, or Putnam’s logical constructs, are automatically discarded.

There are two open questions for the causal account, however. First, for any causal system, there will be a corresponding computational description. This means that even if it is no longer true that all physical systems implement all possible computations, they still implement at least one computation (if there are multiple causal models of a given system, the number of corresponding computations of course grows). Causal theorists usually bite the bullet by replying that this does not make computational explanation void; it just allows a weak form of pancomputationalism (which is the claim that everything is computational (Müller 2009; Piccinini 2007a)). The second question is how the boundaries of causal systems are to be drawn. Should we try to model a computer’s distal causes (including the operations at the production site of its electronic components) in the causal model brought into correspondence with the formal model of computation? This seems absurd, but there is no explicit reply to this problem in the causal account.

d. Mechanistic Account

The mechanistic account is a specific version of the causal account, defended by Piccinini and Miłkowski. The first move made by both is to take into account only functional mechanisms, which excludes weak pancomputationalisms. (The requirement that the systems should have the function —in some robust sense —of computing has also been defended by other authors, compare (Lycan 1987; Sterelny 1990)). Another is to argue that computational systems should be understood as multi-level systems, which fits naturally with the mechanistic account of computational explanation. Note that mechanists in the philosophy of science have already faced the difficult question of how to draw a boundary around systems, for example by including only components constitutively relevant to the capacity of the mechanism; compare (Craver 2007). For this reason, the mechanistic account is supposed to deliver a satisfactory approach to delineating computational mechanisms from their environment.

Another specific feature of the mechanistic account of computation is that it makes clear how the formal account of computation corresponds to the physical mechanism. Namely, the isolated level of the mechanism (level 0, see section 2.c above) is supposed to be described by a mechanistically adequate model of computation. The description of the model usually comprises two parts: (1) an abstract specification of a computation, which should include all the causally relevant variables (a formal model of the mechanism); (2) a complete blueprint of the mechanism at this level of its organization.

Even if one remains skeptical about causation or physical mechanisms, Putnam and Searle’s objections can be rejected in the mechanistic account of implementation, to the extent that these theoretical posits are admissible in special sciences. What is clear from this discussion is that implementation is not a matter of any simple mapping but of satisfying a number of additional constraints usually required by causal modeling in science.

4. Other objections to CTM

The objection discussed in section 3 is by no means the only objection discussed in philosophy, but it is special because of its potential to completely trivialize CTM. Another very influential objection against CTM (and against the very possibility of creating genuine artificial intelligence) stems from Searle’s Chinese Room thought experiment. The debate over this thought experiment is, at best, inconclusive, so it does not show that CTM is doomed (for more discussion on Chinese Room, see also (Preston and Bishop 2002)). Similarly, all arguments that purport to show that artificial intelligence (AI) is in principle impossible seem to be equally unconvincing, even if they were cogent at some point in time when related to some domains of human competence (for example, for a long time it has been thought that decent machine translation is impossible; it has been even argued that funding research into machine speech recognition is morally wrong, compare (Weizenbaum 1976, 176)). The relationship between AI and CTM is complex: even if non-human AI is impossible, it does not imply that CTM is wrong, as it may turn out that only biologically-inspired AI is possible.

One group of objections against CTM focuses on its alleged reliance on the claim that cognition should be explained merely in terms of computation. This motivates, for example, claims that CTM ignores emotional or bodily processes (see Embodied Cognition). Such claims are, however, unsubstantiated: proponents of CTM more often than not ignore emotions (though even early computer simulations focused on motivation and emotion; compare (Tomkins and Messick 1963; Colby and Gilbert 1964; Loehlin 1968)) or embodiment, though this is not at the core of their claims. Furthermore, according to the most successful theories of implementation, both causal and mechanistic, a physical computation always has properties that are over and above its computational features. It is these physical features that make this computation possible in the first place, and ignoring them (for example, ignoring the physical constitution of neurons) simply leaves the implementation unexplained. For this reason, it seems quite clear that CTM cannot really involve a rejection of all other explanations; the causal relevance of computation implies causal relevance of other physical features, which means that embodied cognition is implied by CTM, rather than excluded.

Jerry Fodor has argued that it is central cognition that cannot be explained computationally, in particular in the symbolic way (and that no other explanation is forthcoming). This claim seems to fly in the face of the success of production systems in such domains as reasoning and problem solving. Fodor justifies his claim by pointing out that central cognitive processes are cognitively impenetrable, which means that an agent’s knowledge and beliefs may influence any other of his other beliefs (which also means that beliefs are strongly holistic). But even if one accepts the claim that there is a substantial (and computational) difference between cognitively penetrable and impenetrable processes, this still wouldn’t rule out a scientific account of both (Boden 1988, 172).

Arguments against the possibility of a computational account of common sense (Dreyfus 1972) also appeal to Holism. Some also claim that it leads to the frame problem in AI, though this has been debated; while the meaning of the frame problem for CTM is unclear (Pylyshyn 1987; Shanahan 1997; Shanahan and Baars 2005).

A specific group of arguments against CTM is directed against the claim that cognition is digital effective computation: some propose that the mind is hypercomputational and try to prove this with reference to Gödel’s proof of undecidability (Lucas 1961; Penrose 1989). These arguments are not satisfactory because they assume without justification that human beliefs are not contradictory (Putnam 1960; Krajewski 2007). Even if they are genuinely contradictory, the claim that the mind is not a computational mechanism cannot be proven this way, as Krajewski has argued, showing that the proof leads to a contradiction.

5. Conclusion

The Computational Theory of Mind (CTM) is the working assumption of the vast majority of modeling efforts in cognitive science, though there are important differences among various computational accounts of mental processes. With the growing sophistication of modeling and testing techniques, computational neuroscience offers more and more refined versions of CTM, which are more complex than early attempts to model mind as a single computational device ( such as a Turing machine). What is much more plausible, at least biologically, is a complex organization of various computational mechanisms, some permanent and some ephemeral, in a structure that does not form a strict hierarchy. The general agreement in cognitive science is, however, that the generic claim that minds process information, even if it is an empirical hypothesis that might prove wrong, is highly unlikely to turn out false. Yet it is far from clear what kind of processing is involved.

6. References and Further Reading

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  • Anderson, John R. 1983. The Architecture of Cognition. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Apter, Michael. 1970. The Computer Simulation of Behaviour. London: Hutchinson.
  • Arbib, Michael, Carl Lee Baker, Joan Bresnan, Roy G. D’Andrade, Ronald Kaplan, Samuel Jay Keyser, Donald A. Norman, et al. 1978. Cognitive Science, 1978.
  • Bechtel, William. 2008. Mental Mechanisms. New York: Routledge (Taylor & Francis Group).
  • Bechtel, William, and Adele Abrahamsen. 2002. Connectionism and the Mind. Blackwell.
  • Blokpoel, Mark, Johan Kwisthout, and Iris van Rooij. 2012. “When Can Predictive Brains Be Truly Bayesian?” Frontiers in Psychology 3 (November): 1–3.
  • Boden, Margaret A. 1988. Computer Models of Mind: Computational Approaches in Theoretical Psychology. Cambridge [England]; New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bowers, Jeffrey S. 2009. “On the Biological Plausibility of Grandmother Cells: Implications for Neural Network Theories in Psychology and Neuroscience.” Psychological Review 116 (1) (January): 220–51.
  • Chalmers, David J. 2011. “A Computational Foundation for the Study of Cognition.” Journal of Cognitive Science (12): 325–359.
  • Clark, Andy. 2013. “Whatever Next? Predictive Brains, Situated Agents, and the Future of Cognitive Science.” The Behavioral and Brain Sciences 36 (3) (June 10): 181–204.
  • Colby, Kenneth Mark, and John P Gilbert. 1964. “Programming a Computer Model of Neurosis.” Journal of Mathematical Psychology 1 (2) (July): 405–417.
  • Copeland, B. Jack. 1996. “What Is Computation?” Synthese 108 (3): 335–359.
  • Copeland, B. 2004. “Hypercomputation: Philosophical Issues.” Theoretical Computer Science 317 (1-3) (June): 251–267.
  • Craver, Carl F. 2007. Explaining the Brain. Mechanisms and the Mosaic Unity of Neuroscience. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Cummins, Robert. 1975. “Functional Analysis.” The Journal of Philosophy 72 (20): 741–765.
  • Cummins, Robert. 1983. The Nature of Psychological Explanation. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Cummins, Robert. 2000. “‘How Does It Work’ Versus ‘What Are the Laws?’: Two Conceptions of Psychological Explanation.” In Explanation and Cognition, ed. F Keil and Robert A Wilson, 117–145. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Dennett, Daniel C. 1983. “Beyond Belief.” In Thought and Object, ed. Andrew Woodfield. Oxford University Press.
  • Dennett, Daniel C. 1987. The Intentional Stance. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Dreyfus, Hubert. 1972. What Computers Can’t Do: A Critique of Artificial Reason. New York: Harper & Row, Publishers.
  • Eliasmith, Chris. 2013. How to Build the Brain: a Neural Architecture for Biological Cognition. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Eliasmith, Chris, and Charles H. Anderson. 2003. Neural Engineering. Computation, Representation, and Dynamics in Neurobiological Systems. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Eliasmith, Chris, Terrence C Stewart, Xuan Choo, Trevor Bekolay, Travis DeWolf, Yichuan Tang, Charlie Tang, and Daniel Rasmussen. 2012. “A Large-scale Model of the Functioning Brain.” Science (New York, N.Y.) 338 (6111) (November 30): 1202–5.
  • Fodor, Jerry A. 1968. Psychological Explanation: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Psychology. New York: Random House.
  • Fodor, Jerry A. 1974. “Special Sciences (or: The Disunity of Science as a Working Hypothesis).” Synthese 28 (2) (October): 97–115.
  • Fodor, Jerry A. 1975. The Language of Thought. 1st ed. New York: Thomas Y. Crowell Company.
  • Fodor, Jerry A. 2001. The Mind Doesn’t Work That Way. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
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Author Information

Marcin Milkowski
Email: marcin.milkowski@gmail.com
Institute of Philosophy and Sociology
Polish Academy of Sciences

David Hume: Religion

David HumeDavid Hume (1711-1776) was called “Saint David” and “The Good David” by his friends, but his adversaries knew him as “The Great Infidel.” His contributions to religion have had a lasting impact and contemporary significance. Taken individually, Hume gives novel insights into many aspects of revealed and natural theology. When taken together, however, they provide his attempt at a systematic undermining of the justifications for religion. Religious belief is often defended through revealed theology, natural theology, or pragmatic advantage. However, through Hume’s various philosophical writings, he works to critique each of these avenues of religious justification.

Though Hume’s final view on religion is not clear, what is certain is that he was not a theist in any traditional sense. He gives a sweeping argument that we are never justified in believing testimony that a miracle has occurred, because the evidence for uniform laws of nature will always be stronger. If correct, this claim would undermine the veracity of any sacred text, such as the Bible, which testifies to miracles and relies on them as its guarantor of truth. As such, Hume rejects the truth of any revealed religion, and further shows that, when corrupted with inappropriate passions, religion has harmful consequences to both morality and society. Further, he argues, rational arguments cannot lead us to a deity. Hume develops what are now standard objections to the analogical design argument by insisting that the analogy is drawn only from limited experience, making it impossible to conclude that a cosmic designer is infinite, morally just, or a single being. Nor can we use such depictions to inform other aspects of the world, such as whether there is a dessert-based afterlife. He also defends what is now called “the Problem of Evil,” namely, that the concept of an all powerful, all knowing, and all good God is inconsistent with the existence of suffering.

Lastly, Hume is one of the first philosophers to systematically explore religion as a natural phenomenon, suggesting how religious belief can arise from natural, rather that supernatural means.

Table of Contents

  1. Hume’s Publications on Religious Belief
  2. Interpretations of Hume’s View
  3. Miracles
  4. Immortality of the Soul
  5. The Design Argument
  6. The Cosmological Argument
  7. The Problem of Evil
  8. The Psychology of Religious Belief
  9. The Harms of Religion
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Hume’s Works on Religion
    2. Works in the History of Philosophy

1. Hume’s Publications on Religious Belief

Hume is one of the most important philosophers to have written in the English language, and many of his writings address religious subjects either directly or indirectly. His very first work had the charge of atheism leveled against it, and this led to his being passed over for the Chair of Moral Philosophy at the University of Edinburgh. In fact, Hume’s views on religion were so controversial that he never held a university position in philosophy.

Hume addressed most of the major issues within the philosophy of religion, and even today theists feel compelled to confront Hume’s challenges. He leveled moral, skeptical, and pragmatic objections against both popular religion and the religion of the philosophers. These run the gamut from highly specific topics, such as metaphysical absurdities entailed by the Real Presence of the Eucharist, to broad critiques like the impossibility of using theology to infer anything about the world.

Hume’s very first work, A Treatise of Human Nature, includes considerations against an immortal soul, develops a system of morality independent of a deity, attempts to refute occasionalism, and argues against a necessary being, to name but a few of the religious topics that it addresses. Hume’s Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding re-emphasizes several of the challenges from the Treatise, but also includes a section against miracles and a section against the fruitfulness of theology. Hume’s major non-philosophical work, The History of England, discusses specific religious sects, largely in terms of their (often bloody) consequences. He also wrote numerous essays discussing various aspects of religion, such as the anti-doctrinal essays “Of the Immortality of the Soul” and “Of Suicide,” and critiques of organized religion and the clergy in “Of Superstition and Enthusiasm” and “Of National Characters.” Hume also wrote two major works entirely dedicated to religion: The Natural History of Religion (Natural History) and the Dialogues concerning Natural Religion (Dialogues), which merit brief discussions of their own.

Hume wrote the Natural History roughly in tandem with the first draft of the Dialogues, but while the former was published during his lifetime (as one of his Four Dissertations), the latter was not. In the introduction to the Natural History, Hume posits that there are two types of inquiry to be made into religion: its foundations in reason and its origin in human nature. While the Dialogues investigate the former, the task of the Natural History is to explore the latter. In the Natural History, he focuses on how various passions can give rise to common or false religion. It is an innovative work that brings together threads from philosophy, psychology, and history to provide a naturalistic account of how the various world religions came about.

Though Hume began writing the Dialogues at roughly the same time as the Natural History, he ultimately arranged to have the former published posthumously. In the twenty-five years between the time at which he first wrote them and his death, the Dialogues underwent three sets of revisions, including a final revision from his deathbed. The Dialogues are a rich discussion of Natural Theology, and are generally considered to be the most important book ever written on the subject. Divided into twelve parts, the Dialogues follow the discussion of three thinkers debating the nature of God. Of the three characters, Philo takes up the role of the skeptic, Demea represents the orthodox theologian of Hume’s day, and Cleanthes follows a more philosophical, empirical approach to his theology. The work is narrated by Pamphilus, a professed student of Cleanthes.

Both Hume’s style and the fact of posthumous publication give rise to interpretive difficulties. Stylistically, Hume’s Dialogues are modeled after On the Nature of the Gods, a dialogue by the Roman philosopher Cicero. In Circero’s works, unlike the dialogues of Plato, Leibniz, and Berkeley, a victor is not established from the outset, and all characters make important contributions. Hume ridicules such one-sided dialogues on the grounds that they put “nothing but Nonsense into the Mouth of the Adversary” (L1, Letter 72). The combination of this stylistic preference with Hume’s use of irony, an infrequently discussed but frequently employed literary device in his writings, makes the work a delight to read, but creates interpretive difficulties in determining who speaks for Hume on any given topic.

In the Dialogues, all the characters make good Humean points, even Pamphilus and Demea. The difficulty comes in determining who speaks for Hume when the characters disagree. Hume has been interpreted as Cleanthes/Pamphilus, Philo, an amalgamation, and as none of them. The most popular view, though not without dissent, construes Hume as Philo. Philo certainly has the most to say in the Dialogues. His arguments and objections often go unanswered, and he espouses many opinions on both religion and on other philosophical topics that Hume endorses in other works, such as the hypothesis that causal inference is based on custom. The more significant challenge to interpreting Hume as Philo concerns the collection of remarks at the beginning of Part XII of the Dialogues, known as Philo’s Reversal. After spending the bulk of the Dialogues raising barrage of objections against the design argument, Part XII has Philo admitting, “A purpose, an intention, a design strikes everywhere the most careless, the most stupid thinker…” (D 12.2). Nonetheless, whether Philo’s Reversal is sincere or not is fundamentally tied to Hume’s own views on religion.

2. Interpretations of Hume’s View

Given the comprehensive critique that Hume levels against religion, it is clear that he is not a theist in any traditional sense. However, acknowledging this point does little to settle Hume’s considered views on religion. There remain three positions open to Hume: atheist naturalism, skeptical agnosticism, or some form of deism. The first position has Hume denying any form of supernaturalism, and is much more popular outside of Hume scholarship than within. The reason for this is that it runs contrary to Hume’s attitude regarding speculative metaphysics. It has him making a firm metaphysical commitment by allowing an inference from our having no good reason for thinking that there are supernatural entities, to a positive commitment that in fact there are none. However, Hume would not commit the Epistemic Fallacy and thereby allow the inference from “x is all we can know of subject y” to “x constitutes the real, mind-independent essence of y.” Indeed, in Part XII of the first Enquiry, Hume explicitly denies the inference from what we can know from our ideas to what is the case in reality.

These considerations against a full-fledged atheist position motivate the skeptical view. While atheism saddles Hume with too strong a metaphysical commitment, the skeptical view also holds that he does not affirm the existence of any supernatural entities. This view has Hume doubting the existence of supernatural entities, but still allowing their possibility. It has the advantage of committing Hume to the sparse ontology of the naturalist without actually committing him to potentially dogmatic metaphysical positions. Hence, Hume can be an atheist for all intents and purposes without actually violating his own epistemic principles.

Both the atheist and skeptical interpretations must, then, take Philo’s Reversal as insincere. Perhaps Hume feared the political consequences of publically denouncing theism; alternatively, he may have used Philo’s Reversal simply as a dialectical tool of the Dialogues. Many scholars tend to steer clear of the former for several reasons. First, while it was true that, early in his career, Hume edited his work to avoid giving offense, this was not the case later. For example, Hume excised the miracles argument from the Treatise, but it later found its way into print in the Enquiry. Second, Hume arranged to have the Dialogues published after his death, and therefore had no reason to fear repercussions for himself. Further, Hume did not seem to think that the content would bring grief to his nephew who brought it to publication, as he revealed in a letter to his publisher (L2, Appendix M). Third, it is not only in the Dialogues that we get endorsements of a deity or of a design argument. J.C.A. Gaskin (1988: 219) provides an extensive (though not exhaustive) list of several other places in which we get similar pro-deistic endorsements from Hume. Lastly, it is generally considered hermeneutically appropriate to invoke disingenuousness only if an alternative interpretation cannot be plausibly endorsed.

Norman Kemp Smith, in his commentary on the Dialogues, argues in favor of just such an alternative interpretation. Though he interprets Hume as Philo, he has the Reversal as insincerely made, not from fear, but as a dialectical tool. In his Ciceronian dialogue, Hume does not want the reader, upon finishing the piece, to interpret any of the characters as victorious, instead encouraging them to reflect further upon these matters. Thus, Philo’s Reversal is part of a “dramatic balance” intended to help mask the presence of a clear victor.

Nelson Pike, in his own commentary on the Dialogues, roundly criticizes Kemp Smith’s position. We should instead look for reasons to take the Reversal as genuine. One possibility he considers is the presence of the “irregular arguments” of Part III. Here, instead of presenting design arguments based on standard analogical reasoning, Cleanthes presents considerations in which design will, “immediately flow in upon you with a force like that of sensation” (D 3.7). Pike therefore interprets these “irregular arguments” as non-inferential. If this is right, and the idea of a designer comes upon us naturally rather than inferentially, as Ronald Butler, Stanley Tweyman, and others have argued, then Philo’s Reversal is not a reversal at all. He can consistently maintain that the inference of the design argument is insufficient for grounding one’s belief in God, and that nonetheless, we have a natural inclination to accept it.

There is, therefore, support for interpreting Hume as a deist of a limited sort. Gaskin calls this Hume’s “attenuated deism,” attenuated in that the analogy to something like human intelligence is incredibly remote, and that no morality of the deity is implied, due especially to the Problem of Evil. However, scholars that attribute weak deism to Hume are split in regard to the source of the belief. Some, like Gaskin, think that Hume’s objections to the design argument apply only to analogies drawn too strongly. Hence, Hume does not reject all design arguments, and , provided that the analogs are properly qualified, might allow the inference. This is different than the picture suggested by Butler and discussed by Pike in which the belief is provided by a natural, non-rational faculty and thereby simply strikes us, rather than as the product of an inferential argument. Therefore, though the defenders of a deistic Hume generally agree about the remote, non-moral nature of the deity, there is a fundamental schism regarding the justification and generation of this belief. Both sides, however, agree that the belief should not come from special revelation, such as miracles or revealed texts.

3. Miracles

Because Hume’s denial of all miracles in section X of the Enquiry entails a denial of all revealed theology, it is worthwhile to consider his arguments in detail. The section is divided into two parts. While Part I provides an argument against believing in miracles in general, Part II gives four specific considerations against miracles based on particular facts about the world. Therefore, we may refer to the argument of Part I as Hume’s Categorical Argument against miracles and those of Part II as the four Evidential Arguments against miracles. Identifying Hume’s intentions with these arguments is notoriously difficult. Though the Evidential Arguments are fairly straightforward in and of themselves, there are two major interpretive puzzles: what the Categorical Argument of Part I is supposed to be, and how it fits with the Evidential Arguments of Part II. Some see the two parts as entirely separable, while others insist that they provide two parts of a cohesive whole. The following reconstructions attempt to stay interpretively neutral on these disputes.

Hume begins Part I with rules for the appropriate proportioning of belief. First, he divides arguments that justify beliefs regarding cause and effect into proofs and probabilities. Proofs are arguments supported by evidence in which the effects have been constant, such as the sun rising every day. However, there are stronger and weaker proofs—consider a professor showing up for class every day versus the sun rising every day—and only the strongest proofs, those supporting our beliefs in the laws of nature, have been attested to “in all countries and all ages.” Effects, however, are not always constant. When faced with a “contrariety of effects,” we must instead use probabilities, which are evidentially weaker than proofs. Since the strength of both proofs and probabilities varies in degree, we have the potential for “all imaginable degrees of assurance.” Hume maintains that, “The wise man…proportions his beliefs to the evidence.” In cases where effects have been constant and therefore supported by proof, our beliefs are held with a greater degree of assurance than those supported by mere probability (EHU 10.1-4).

Having explained Hume’s model for proportioning beliefs, we can now consider its ramifications for attested miracles:

A miracle is a violation of the laws of nature; and as a firm and unalterable experience has established these laws, the proof against a miracle, from the very nature of the fact, is as entire as any argument from experience can possibly be imagined. (EHU 10.12)

Here, Hume defines a miracle as a “violation of the laws of nature” though he then “accurately” defines a miracle in a footnote as “a transgression of a law of nature by a particular volition of the Deity or by the interposition of some invisible agent.” As to which definition is more relevant, the second more adequately captures the notion of a miracle. In a 1761 letter to Blair, Hume indicates that, as an empirical fact, miracles always have religious content: “I never read of a miracle in my life that was not meant to establish some new point of religion” (L1, Letter 188). A Humean miracle is, therefore, a violation of a law of nature whose cause is an agent outside of nature, though the incompatibility with a law of nature is all that the Categorical Argument requires.

We must, therefore, consider Hume’s conception of the laws of nature. Following Donald Livingston, we may draw out some of the explicit features of Hume’s conception. They are universal, so any falsification of a supposed law or a law’s failure to be upheld would be sufficient to rob it of its nomological status. Laws, therefore, admit of no empirical counterexamples. Secondly, laws of nature are matters of fact, not relations of ideas, as their denial is always coherent. Indeed, like any other matter of fact, they must have some empirical content. As Livingston concludes, “…it must be possible to discipline theoretical talk about unobservable causal powers with empirical observations” (Livingston 1984: 203).

Utilizing this conception of the laws of nature, Hume draws his conclusion:

There must, therefore, be a uniform experience against every miraculous event, otherwise the event would not merit that appellation. And as the uniform experience amounts to a proof, then there is here a direct and full proof, from the nature of the fact, against the existence of any miracle; nor can such a proof be destroyed, or the miracle rendered credible, but by an opposite proof, which is superior….no testimony is sufficient to establish a miracle, unless the testimony be of such a kind, that its falsehood would be more miraculous, than the fact, which it endeavors to establish…. (EHU 10.12-10.13; SBN 115-116, Hume’s emphasis)

The interpretation of this passage requires considerable care. As many commentators have pointed out, if Hume’s argument is: a miracle is a violation of a law of nature, but laws of nature do not admit of counterexamples, therefore there are no miracles, then Hume clearly begs the question. Call this the Caricature Argument. William Paley first attributed this to Hume, and the interpretation has had proponents ever since; but this cannot be Hume’s argument. The Caricature Argument faces three major obstacles, two of which are insurmountable. However, considering the inaccuracies of the Caricature Argument will help us to arrive at a more accurate reconstruction.

First, the Caricature Argument is an a priori, deductive argument from definition. This would make it a demonstration in Hume's vernacular, not a proof. Nonetheless, both the argument of Section X and the letter in which he elucidates it repeatedly appeal to the evidence against miracles as constituting a proof. If the Caricature Argument were correct, then the argument against miracles could not be labeled as such.

A second, related problem is that, if one accepts the Caricature Argument, then one must accept the entailed modality. From the conclusion of the a priori deductive argument, it follows that the occurrence of a miracle would be impossible. If this were the case, then no testimony could persuade a person to believe in the existence of a miracle. However, many take Hume to implicitly reject such an assumption. Such critics point to Hume’s acceptance of the claim that if a sufficient number of people testify to an eight-day darkness, then this constitutes a proof of its occurrence (EHU 10.36). Therefore, there are hypothetical situations in which our belief in a miracle could be established by testimony, implying that the conclusion of the Caricature Argument is too strong. This reply, however, is incorrect. Hume’s description of the proof for total darkness is generally interpreted as his establishing criteria for the rational justification of a belief, based on testimony, that a miracle has occurred. However, we must note that the passage that immediately precedes the example contains an ambiguous disjunct: “…there may possibly be miracles, or violations of the usual course of nature, of such a kind as to admit proof from human testimony” (EHU 10.36 emphasis added). From this passage alone, it is not clear whether Hume means for the darkness scenario to count as an example of the former, the latter, or both. Nevertheless, in Hume’s letter to Blair, he presents a similar example with an unambiguous conclusion. In considering Campbell’s complaint that it is a contradiction for Hume to introduce a fiction in which the testimony of miracle constitutes a proof, he has us consider his previous example concerning the

...supposition of testimony for a particular miracle [that might] amount to a full proof of it. For instance, the absence of the sun during 48 hours; but reasonable men would only conclude from this fact, that the machine of the globe was disordered during this time. (L1, Letter 188)

The conclusion Hume draws is that, even if testimony of a strange event were to amount to a full proof, it would be more reasonable to infer a hiccup in the natural regularity of things (on par with an eclipse, where apparent, but not the disturbance of a higher level regularity), rather than to conclude a miracle. Therefore, when presented with a situation that is either a miracle or a “violation of the usual course of nature,” we ought to infer the latter.

This preference for a naturalistic explanation is reemphasized in Hume’s discussion of Joan of Arc in the History of England. Hume states:

It is the business of history to distinguish between the miraculous and the marvelous; to reject the first in all narrations merely profane and human; to doubt the second; and when obliged by unquestionable testimony…to admit of something extraordinary, to receive as little of it as is consistent with the known facts and circumstances. (H 2.20, Hume’s emphasis )

Here, he once more suggests that we always reject the miraculous testimony and only accept as much of the marvelous as is required to remain consistent with the “unquestionable testimony.” For Hume, testimony of a miracle is always to be rejected in favor of the naturalistic interpretation. He therefore never grants a proof of a miracle as a real possibility, so the Caricature Argument may surmount at least this objection.

However, a final difficulty related to the modality of the conclusion concerns the observation that Hume couches his argument in terms of appropriate belief. Hume’s conclusion should, therefore, be interpreted as epistemic, but the Caricature Argument instead requires a metaphysical conclusion: miracles are impossible. The Caricature Argument cannot be correct, because Hume’s entire argument hinges on the way that we apportion our beliefs, and a fortiori, beliefs about testimony. Hume speaks of “our evidence” for the truth of miracles, belief in them being “contrary to the rules of just reasoning,” and miracles never being “established on…evidence.” “A miracle can never be proved” is a far cry from saying that a miracle has never occurred and never could occur. This gives us reason to reject the metaphysical conclusion of the Caricature Argument.

There are also logical implications against the metaphysical conclusion, such as Hume’s avowal that miracles have an essence, and that there can be un-witnessed miracles. Hume does not say that violations are impossible, only unknowable. Of course, it could be that Hume grants this merely for the sake of argument, but then the stronger conclusion would still have a problem. For whether or not Hume grants the occurrence of miracles, he certainly allows for their conceivability, something the Caricature Argument cannot allow since, for Hume, conceivability implies possibility. Finally, there is the fact that Part II exists at all. If Hume did indeed think that Part I established that miracles could never occur, the entire second part, where he shows that “…there never was a miraculous event established on… [sufficient] evidence” (EHU 10.14), would be logically superfluous. The proper conclusion is, therefore, the epistemic one.

In overcoming the weaknesses of the Caricature Argument, a more plausible Humean argument takes form. Hume’s Categorical Argument of Part I may be reconstructed as follows:

  1. Beliefs about matters of fact are supported only by proofs (stronger) or probabilities (weaker) that come in varying degrees of strength. [Humean Axiom- T, EHU 6.1, EHU 10.6]
  2. When beliefs about matters of fact conflict, assent ought to be given only to the sufficiently supported belief with the greatest degree of evidential support. [Humean Axiom- EHU 10.4, EHU 10.11]
  3. Belief in the occurrence of a miracle would be a matter of fact belief that conflicts with belief in at least one law of nature. [Humean Axiom- EHU 10.2]
  4. Laws of nature are matter of fact beliefs evidentially supported by proofs of the strongest possible type [Empirical Premise- EHU 10.2]
  5. Both testimonial probabilities supporting the occurrence of a miracle and (hypothetical) testimonial proofs supporting the occurrence of a miracle would be evidentially weaker than the proofs supporting the laws of nature. [Empirical Premise- EHU 10.2, EHU 10.13, EHU 10.36. The first clause is true by definition for probabilities, but Hume also establishes it more clearly in Part II.]
  6. Therefore, we should never believe testimony that a miracle has occurred.

There is much to be said for this reconstruction. First, in addition to Humean axioms, we have empirical premises rather than definitions that support the key inferences. Hence, the reconstruction is a proof, not a demonstration. Second, given that Hume has ancillary arguments for these empirical premises, there is no question-begging of the form that the Caricature Argument suggests. For instance, he argues for (4) by drawing on his criterion of “in all countries and all ages.” He does not simply assert that laws of nature automatically meet this criterion.

However, there is a separate worry of question-begging in (4) that needs to be addressed before moving on to the arguments of Part II. The challenge is that, in maintaining Hume’s position that men in all ages testify to the constancy of the laws of nature, any testimony to the contrary (that is, testimony of the miraculous) must be excluded. However, there are people that do testify to miracles. The worry is that, in assigning existence to laws of nature without testimonial exception, Hume may beg the question against those that maintain the occurrence of miracles.

This worry can be overcome, however, if we follow Don Garrett in realizing what Hume is attempting to establish in the argument:

… [when] something has the status of “law of nature”- that is, plays the cognitive role of a “law of nature”- for an individual judger…it has the form of a universal generalization, is regarded by the judger as causal, and is something for which the judger has firm and unalterable experience….This is, of course, compatible with there actually being exceptions to it, so long as one of those exceptions has, for the judger, the status of experiments within his or her experience. (Garrett 1997: 152, Hume’s emphasis)

Garrett rightly points out that in Hume’s argument laws of nature govern our belief, and fulfill a certain doxastic role for the judger. Nonetheless, once this is realized, we can strengthen Garrett’s point by recognizing that this role is, in fact, a necessary condition for testimony of a miracle. To believe in a miracle, the witness must believe that a law of nature has been violated. However, this means that, in endorsing the occurrence of the miracle, the witness implicitly endorses two propositions: that there is an established law of nature in place and that it has been broken. Thus, in order for a witness to convince me of a miracle, we must first agree that there is a law in place. The same testimony which seeks to establish the miracle reaffirms the nomological status of the law as universally believed.

This leads to the second point that Garrett raises. Only after this common ground is established do we consider, as an experiment, whether we should believe that the said law has been violated. Hence, even such a testimonial does not count against the universality of what we, the judges, take to be a law of nature. Instead, we are setting it aside as experimental in determining whether we should offer assent to the purported law or not. If this is right, then (4) does not beg the question. This leaves us with empirical premise (5), which leads to Part II.

Hume begins Part II by stating that, in granting that the testimonies of miracles may progress beyond mere probability, “we have been a great deal too liberal in our concession…” (EHU 10.14). He then gives four considerations as to why this is the case, three of which are relatively straightforward.

First, Hume tells us that, as an empirical fact, “there is not to be found, in all history, any miracle attested by a sufficient number of men, of such unquestioned good sense, education, and learning…” to secure its testimony (EHU 10.15). To be persuaded of a miracle, we would need to be sure that no natural explanation, such as delusion, deception, and so forth, was more likely than the miraculous, a task which, for Hume, would simply take more credible witnesses than have ever attested to a miracle.

Second, it is a fact of human nature that we find surprise and wonder agreeable. We want to believe in the miraculous, and we are much more likely to pass along stories of the miraculous than of the mundane. For Hume, this explains why humans tend to be more credulous with attested miracles than should reasonably be the case, and also explains why the phenomenon is so widespread.

His third, related presumption against miracles is that testimony of their occurrence tends to be inversely proportionate to education: miracles “are observed chiefly to abound among ignorant and barbarous nations” (EHU 10.20). Hume’s explanation for this is that purported miracles are generally born of ignorance. Miracles are used as placeholders when we lack the knowledge of natural causes. However, as learning progresses, we become increasingly able to discover natural causes, and no longer need to postulate miraculous explanations.

Hume’s fourth consideration is also his most difficult:

Every miracle, therefore, pretended to have wrought in any of these religions…as its direct scope is to establish the particular system to which it is attributed; so has it the same force, though more indirectly, to overthrow every other system. In destroying a rival system, it likewise destroys the credit of those miracles, on which that system was established; so that all the [miracles] of different religions are to be regarded as contrary facts, and evidence of these…as opposite to each other. (EHU 10.24)

His general idea is that, since multiple, incompatible religions testify to miracles, they cancel each other out in some way, but scholars disagree as to how this is supposed to happen. Interpreters such as Gaskin (1988: 137-138) and Keith Yandell (1990: 334) focus on Hume’s claim that miracles are generally purported to support or establish a particular religion. Therefore, a miracle wrought by Jesus is opposed and negated by one wrought by Mohammed, and so forth. However, as both Gaskin and Yandell point out, this inference would be flawed, because miracles are rarely such that they entail accepting one religion exclusively. Put another way, the majority of miracles can be interpreted and accepted by most any religion.

However, there is a more charitable interpretation of Hume’s fourth Evidential Argument. As the rest of the section centers around appropriate levels of doxastic assent, we should think that the notion is at play here too. A less problematic reconstruction therefore has his fourth consideration capturing something like the following intuition: the testifiers of miracles have a problem. In the case of their own religion, their level of incredulity is sufficiently low so as to accept their own purported miracles. However, when they turn to those attested by other religions, they raise their level of incredulity so as to deny these miracles of other faiths. Thus, by participating in a sect that rejects at least some miracles, they thereby undermine their own position. In claiming sufficient grounds for rejecting the miracles of the other sects, they have thereby rejected their own. For Hume, the sectarians cannot have their cake and eat it. Intellectual honesty requires a consistent level of credulity. By rejecting their opponent’s claims to miracles, they commit to the higher level of incredulity and should thereby reject their own. Hence, Hume’s later claim that, in listening to a Christian’s testimony of a miracle, “we are to regard their testimony in the same light as if they had mentioned that Mahometan miracle, and had in express terms contradicted it, with the same certainty as they have for the miracle they relate” (EHU 10.24). Thus, the problem for Hume is not that the sectarians cannot interpret all purported miracles as their own but that they, in fact, do not.

These are the four evidential considerations against miracles Hume provides in Part II. However, if the above reconstruction of Part I is correct, and Hume thinks that the Categorical Argument has established that we are never justified in believing the testimony of miracles, we might wonder why Part II exists at all. Its presence can be justified in several ways. First, on the reconstruction above, Part II significantly bolsters premise (5). Second, even if Part II were logically superfluous, Michael Levine rightly points out that the arguments of Part II can still have a buttressing effect for persuading the reader to the conclusion of Part I, thereby softening the blow of its apparently severe conclusion. A third, related reason is a rhetorical consideration. In order for one’s philosophical position to be well-grounded, it is undesirable to hang one’s hat on a single consideration. As Hume himself acknowledges, resting one part of his system on another would unnecessarily weaken it (T Therefore, the more reasons he can present, the better. Fourth, Hume, as a participant in many social circles, is likely to have debated miracles in many ways against many opponents, each with his or her own favored example. Part II, therefore, gives him the opportunity for more direct and specific redress, and he does indeed address many specific miracles there. Finally, the considerations of Part II, the second and third especially, have an important explanatory effect. If Hume is right that no reasonable person would believe in the existence of miracles based on testimony, then it should seem strange that millions have nevertheless done so. Like the Natural History discussed below, Part II can disarm this worry by explaining why, if Hume is right, we have this widespread phenomenon despite its inherent unreasonableness.

4. Immortality of the Soul

In his essay, “Of the Immortality of the Soul,” Hume presents many pithy and brief arguments against considerations of an afterlife. He offers them under three broad headings, metaphysical, moral, and physical. Written for a popular audience, they should be treated as challenges or considerations against, rather than decisive refutations of, the doctrine.

Hume’s metaphysical considerations largely target the rationalist project of establishing a mental substance a priori (such as the discovery of the “I” in DescartesMeditations ). His first two considerations against this doctrine draw on arguments from his Treatise, referring to his conclusion that we have only a confused and insufficient idea of substance. If this is the case, however, then it becomes exceedingly difficult to discover the essence of such a notion a priori. Further, Hume says, we certainly have no conception of cause and effect a priori, and are therefore in no position to make a priori conclusions about the persistence conditions of a mental substance, or to infer that this substance grounds our thoughts. Indeed, even if we admit a mental substance, there are other problems.

Assuming that there is a mental substance, Hume tells us that we must treat it as relevantly analogous to physical substance. The physical substance of a person disperses after death and loses its identity as a person. Why think that the mental substance would behave otherwise? If the body rots, disperses, and ceases to be human, why not say the same thing of the soul? If we reply by saying that mental substances are simple and immortal, then for Hume, this implies that they would also be non-generable, and should not come into being either. If this were true, we should have memories from before our births, which we clearly do not. Note that here we see Hume drawing on his considerations against miracles; implicitly rejecting the possibility of a system whereby God continuously and miraculously brings souls into existence. Finally, if the rationalists are right that thought implies eternal souls, then animals should have them as well since, in the Treatise, Hume argued that mental traits such as rationality obtain by degree throughout the animal world, rather than by total presence or total absence; but this is something that the Christians of Hume’s day explicitly denied. In this way, Hume’s metaphysical considerations turn the standard rationalist assumptions of the theists, specifically the Christian theists of his day, against them.

The moral considerations, however, require no such presuppositions beyond the traditional depictions of heaven and hell. Hume begins by considering two problems involving God’s justice: first, he addresses the defender of an afterlife who posits its existence as a theodicy, maintaining that there is an afterlife so that the good can be appropriately rewarded and the wicked appropriately punished. For reasons considered in detail below, Hume holds that we cannot infer God’s justice from the world, which means we would need independent reasons for positing an alternate existence. However, the success of the arguments discussed above would largely undercut the adequacy of such reasons. Second, Hume points out that this system would not be just regardless. Firstly, Hume claims it is unwarranted to put so much emphasis on this world if it is so fleeting and minor in comparison to an infinite afterlife. If God metes out infinite punishment for finite crimes, then God is omni-vindictive, and it seems equally unjust to give infinite rewards for finitely meritorious acts. According to Hume, most men are somewhere between good and evil, so what sense is there in making the afterlife absolute? Further, Hume raises difficulties concerning birth. If all but Christians of a particular sect are doomed to hell, for instance, then being born in, say, Japan, would be like losing a cosmic lottery, a notion difficult to reconcile with perfect justice. Finally, Hume emphasizes that punishment without purpose, without some chance of reformation, is not a satisfactory system, and should not be endorsed by a perfect being. Hence, Hume holds that considerations of an afterlife seem to detract from, rather than bolster, God’s perfection.

Lastly are the physical (empirical) considerations, which Hume identifies as the most relevant. First, he points out how deeply and entirely connected the mind and body are. If two objects work so closely together in every other aspect of their existence, then the end of one should also be the end of the other. Two objects so closely linked, and that began to exist together, should also cease to exist together. Second, again in opposition to the rationalist metaphysicians, he points out that dreamless sleep establishes that mental activity can be at least temporarily extinguished; we therefore have no reason to think that it cannot be permanently extinguished. His third consideration is that we know of nothing else in the universe that is eternal, or at least that retains its properties and identity eternally, so it would be strange indeed if there were exactly one thing in all the cosmos that did so. Finally, Hume points out that nature does nothing in vain. If death were merely a transition from one state to another, then nature would be incredibly wasteful in making us dread the event, in providing us with mechanisms and instincts that help us to avoid it, and so forth. That is, it would be wasteful for nature to place so much emphasis on survival. Because of these skeptical considerations, Hume posits that the only argument for an immortal soul is from special revelation, a source he rejects along with miracles.

5. The Design Argument

Having discussed Hume’s rejection of revealed theology, we now turn to his critiques of the arguments of Natural Theology, the most hopeful of which, for Hume, is the Design Argument. His assaults on the design argument come in two very different types. In the Dialogues, Hume’s Philo provides many argument-specific objections, while Section XI of the Enquiry questions the fruitfulness of this type of project generally.

In the Dialogues, Cleanthes defends various versions of the design argument (based on order) and the teleological argument (based on goals and ends). Generally, he does not distinguish between the two, and they are similar in logical form: both are arguments by analogy. In analogical arguments, relevant similarities between two or more entities are used as a basis for inferring further similarities. In this case, Cleanthes is draws an analogy between artifacts and nature: artifacts exhibit certain properties and have a designer/creator; parts, or the totality, of nature exhibit similar properties, therefore, we should infer a relevantly analogous designer/creator. Hume’s Philo raises many objections against such reasoning, most of which are still considered as legitimate challenges to be addressed by contemporary philosophers of religion. Replies, however, will not be addressed here. Though Philo presents numerous challenges to this argument, they can be grouped under four broad headings: the scope of the conclusion, problems of weak analogy, problems with drawing the inference, and problems with allowing the inference. The first two types of problem are related in many cases, but not all. After the objections from the Dialogues are discussed, we will turn to Hume’s more general critique from the first Enquiry.

Scope of the Conclusion: Philo points out that, if the analogy is to be drawn between an artifact and some experienced portion of the universe, then the inferred designer must be inferred only from the phenomena. That is, we can only make merited conclusions about the creator based on the experienced part of the universe that we treat as analogous to an artifact, and nothing beyond this. As Philo argues in Part V, since the experienced portion of the world is finite, then we cannot reasonably infer an infinite creator. Similarly, our limited experience would not allow us to make an inference to an eternal creator, since everything we experience in nature is fleeting. An incorporeal creator is even more problematic, because Hume maintains that the experienced world is corporeal. In fact, even a unified, single creator becomes problematic if we are drawing an analogy between the universe and any type of complex artifact. If we follow someone like William Paley, who maintains that the universe is relevantly similar to a watch, then we must further pursue the analogy in considering how many people contributed to that artifact’s coming to be. Crafting a watch requires that many artificers work on various aspects of the artifact in order to arrive at a finished project. Finally, Philo insists that we also lack the ability to infer a perfect creator or a morally estimable creator, though the reasons for this will be discussed below in the context of the Problem of Evil. Given these limitations that we must place on the analogy, we are left with a very vague notion of a designer indeed. As Philo claims, a supporter of the design analogy is only “…able, perhaps, to assert, or conjecture, that the universe, sometime, arose from something like design: But beyond that position, he cannot ascertain one single circumstance, and is left afterward to fix every point on his [revealed] theology…” (D 5.12). This is Gaskin’s “attenuated deism” mentioned above. However, even weakening the conclusion to this level of imprecision still leaves a host of problems.

Problems of Weak Analogy: As mentioned above, many of Philo’s objections can be classified as either a problem with the scope of the conclusion or as a weak analogy. For instance, concluding an infinite creator from a finite creation would significantly weaken the analogy by introducing a relevant disanalogy, but the argument is not vulnerable in this way if the scope of the conclusion is properly restricted. However, beyond these problems of scope, Philo identifies two properties that serve to weaken the analogy but that cannot be discharged via a sufficient limitation of the conclusion. In Part X, Philo points out the apparent purposelessness of the universe. Designed artifacts are designed for a purpose. An artifact does something. It works toward some goal. Thus, there is a property that all artifacts have in common but that we cannot locate in the universe as a whole. For Philo, the universe is strikingly disanalogous to, for instance, a watch, precisely because the former is not observed to work toward some goal. This weakness cannot be discharged by restricting the conclusion, and any attempt to posit a purpose to the universe will either rely on revealed theology or is simply implausible. To show why Philo thinks this, take a few simplified examples: If we say that the universe exists “for the glory of God,” we not only beg the question about the existence of God, but we also saddle our conception of God with anthropomorphized attributes Hume would find unacceptable, such as pride and the need for recognition. Similar problems exist if we say that the universe was created for God’s amusement. However, if we change tactics and claim that the universe was created for the flourishing of humans, or any other species, then for Hume, we end up ignoring the phenomena in important ways, such as the numerous aspects of the universe that detract from human flourishing (such as mosquitoes) rather than contribute to it, and the vast portions of the universe that seem utterly irrelevant to human existence.

Beyond this, Philo finds another intractably weak analogy between artifacts and natural objects. This is the fundamental difference between nature and artifices. Philo holds that the more we learn about nature, the more striking the disanalogy between nature and artifacts. They are simply too fundamentally different. Consider, for instance, that many aspects of nature are self-maintaining and even self-replicating. Even if there are important analogies to be drawn between a deer and a watch, the dissimilarities, for Philo, will always outweigh them.

Problems with Drawing the Inference: There are further problems with the design inference that go beyond the mere dissimilarity of the analogs. Hume’s Philo raises two such objections based on experience. First, there is no clear logical relationship between order and a designer. In Part VII, Philo argues that we do in fact experience order without agency: an acorn growing into an oak tree shows that one does not need knowledge or intent to bestow order. Nor can we reply that the acorn was designed to produce a tree, for this is the very issue in question, and to import design in this way would beg the question. But if we can have order without a designer, then the mere presence of order cannot allow us to infer presence of design.

His second problem with making the design inference is that, like all inductive inferences, the design argument essentially involves a causal component. However, for Hume, knowledge of causal efficacy requires an experienced constant conjunction of phenomena; that is, only after we have seen that events of type B always follow events of type A do we infer a causal relationship from one to the other (see Hume: Causation). However, the creation of the universe necessarily would be a singular event. Since we do not have experience of multiple worlds coming into existence, causal inferences about any cosmogony become unfathomable for Hume in an important sense. This objection is often interpreted as peculiar to Hume’s own philosophical framework, relying heavily on his account of causation, but the point can be made more generally while still raising a challenge for the design argument. Because of our limited knowledge of the origins, if any, of the universe (especially in the 18th century), it becomes metaphysical hubris to think that we can make accurate inferences pertaining to issues such as: its initial conditions, persistence conditions, what it would take to cause a universe, whether the event has or requires a cause, and so forth. This relates to Philo’s next objection.

Problems when the Inference is Allowed: The previous two objections teach us that there are multiple origins of order, and that we are in a poor epistemic state to make inferences about speculative cosmogony. Taking these two points together, it becomes possible to postulate many hypothetical origins of the universe that are, for Hume, on as solid a footing as that of a designer, but instead rely on a different principle of order. Though Philo indicates that there are many, he specifically identifies only four principles which have been experienced to produce order in our part of the universe alone: reason (that is, rational agency), instinct, generation, and vegetation. Though Cleanthes defends reason as the only relevant principle of order, Philo develops alternative cosmogonies based on vegetation, where the universe grows from a seed, and generation, where the universe is like an animal or is like something created instinctively, such as a spider’s web; but Philo should not be taken as endorsing any of these alternative cosmogonies. Instead, his point is that, since we have just as much reason to think that order can arise from vegetation as it can from rational agency, as we have experience of both, there is no obvious reason to think that the inference to the latter, as the source of the order of the universe, is any better than the inference from the former, since we can make just as good an analogy with any of these. If order can come from multiple sources, and we know nothing about the creation of the universe, then Cleanthes is not in a position to give one a privileged position over the others. This means that, if we are to follow Cleanthes in treating the design inference as satisfactory, then we should treat the other inferences as satisfactory as well. However, since we cannot accept multiple conflicting cosmogonies, Philo maintains that we should refrain from attempting any such inferences. As he says in a different context: “A total suspense of judgement is here our only reasonable resource” (D 8.12).

A second problem Philo raises with allowing the design inference is that doing so can lead to a regress. Let us assume that the designer inference is plausible, that is, that a complex, purposive system requires a designing mind as its principle of order. But wait! Surely a creative mind is itself a complex, purposive system as well. A mind is complex, and its various parts work together to achieve specific goals. Thus, if all such purposive systems require a designing mind as their principle of order, then it follows that we would need a designing mind for the designing mind as well. Using the same inference, we would need a designing mind for that mind, and so on. Hence, allowing that complex, purposive systems require a designing mind as their principle of order leads to an infinite regress of designing minds. In order to stop this regress while still maintaining the design inference, one must demand that the designer of the universe does not require a designer, and there are two ways to make this claim. Either one could say that the designing mind that created the universe is a necessary being whose existence does not require a causal explanation, or one could simply say that the designer’s existence is brute. Cleanthes rejects the former option in his refutation of Demea’s “argument a priori” and, more generally, Hume does not think that this form of necessity is coherent. The only option then is to declare that the designer’s existence is brute, and therefore does not require a designer for its explanation. However, if this is the case, and we are allowing brute, undesigned existences into our ontology, then Philo asks why not declare that the universe itself is the brute existence instead? If we are allowing one instance where complexity and purposiveness does not imply a designer, then why posit an extraneous entity based on what is for Philo a dubious inference when parsimony should lead us to prefer a brute universe?

Setting aside the Problem of Evil for later, these are the major specific challenges Hume raises for the design argument in the Dialogues. However, Hume generalizes our inability to use theology to make analogical inferences about the world in Section XI of the Enquiry. Call it the Inference Problem. Rather than raising specific objections against the design argument, the Inference Problem instead questions the fruitfulness of the project of natural theology generally. Roughly stated, the Inference Problem is that we cannot use facts about the world to argue for the existence of some conception of a creator, and then use that conception of the creator to reveal further facts about the world, such as the future providence of this world, and so forth.

First, it is important to realize that the Inference Problem is a special case of an otherwise unproblematic inference. In science, we make this type of inference all the time; for instance, using phenomena to infer laws of nature and then using those laws of nature to make further predictions. Since Hume is clearly a proponent of scientific methodology, we must ask why the creator of the universe is a special and problematic case. The short answer is because of the worry of the Dialogues discussed above, that the creation of the cosmos is necessarily a singular event. This means that the Inference Problem for a creator is a special case for two reasons: first, when inferring the existence and attributes of a creator deity, Hume demands that we use all available data, literally anything available in the cosmos that might be relevant to our depiction of the creator rather than limiting the scope of our inquiry to a specific subset of phenomena. Hence, the deity we posit would represent our best guess based on all available information, unlike the case of discovering specific laws. Second, because the creation was a singular event, Hume insists that we cannot use analogy, resemblance, and so forth, to make good inductive inferences beyond what we have already done in positing the deity to begin with. On account of these two unique factors, there is a special Inference Problem that will arise whenever we try to use our inferred notion of a creator in order to discover new facts about the world.

In order to better understand the Inference Problem, let us take a concrete example, inferring a creator deity who is also just. There are only two possibilities: either the totality of the available evidence of the experienced cosmos does not imply the existence of a just creator or it does. If it does not, then we simply are not merited in positing a just deity and we therefore are not justified in assuming, for instance, that the deity’s justice will be discovered later, say in an afterlife. But if the evidence does imply a just creator deity (that is, the world is sufficiently just such as to allow the inference to a just creator), then Hume says we have no reason to think that a just afterlife is needed in order to supplement and correct an unjust world. In either case, says Hume, we are not justified in inferring further facts about the world based on our conception of the deity beyond what we have already experienced. Mutatis mutandis, this type of reasoning will apply to any conclusion drawn from natural theology. Our conception of the deity should be our best approximation based on the totality of available evidence. This means that for Hume, there are only two possibilities: either any relevant data is already considered and included in inferring our conception of the creator to begin with, and we therefore learn nothing new about the world; or the data is inconclusive and simply insufficient to support the inference to the conception of the deity. Hence, we cannot reasonably make it. If the data is not already there, then it cannot be realized from a permissible inference from the nature of the deity. However, if this is right, then the religious hypothesis of natural theology supplies no new facts about the world and is therefore explanatorily impotent.

6. The Cosmological Argument

Hume couches his concerns about theological inference as emanating from problems with drawing an analogical design inference. Since this is not the only type of argument in natural theology, we must now consider Hume’s reasons for rejecting other arguments that support the existence of a creator deity. Hume never makes a clear distinction between what Immanuel Kant later dubbed ontological and cosmological arguments, instead Hume lumps them together under the heading of arguments a priori. Note that this is not as strange as it might first appear, because although cosmological arguments are now uniformly thought of as a posteriori rather than a priori, this was not the case in Hume’s day. It took Hume’s own insights about the a posteriori nature of causation and of the Principle of Sufficient Reason to make us realize this. For Hume, what is common among such ontological and cosmological arguments is that they infer the existence of a necessary being. Hume seems to slip here, failing to distinguish between the logical necessity of the deity concluded by ontological arguments and the metaphysical necessity of the deity concluded by cosmological arguments. He therefore uniformly rejects all such arguments due to the incoherence of a necessary being, a rejection found in both the Dialogues and the first Enquiry.

In Part IX of the Dialogues, Demea presents his “argument a priori,” a cosmological argument based on considerations of necessity and contingency. The argument was intentionally similar to a version proffered by Samuel Clarke, but is also similar to arguments defended by both Leibniz and Aquinas. Before discussing the rejection of this argument, it is significant to note that it is not Philo that rejects Demea’s “argument a priori” but Cleanthes. Philo simply sits back and lets the assault occur without his help. This is telling because Cleanthes is a theist, though for Hume, ultimately misguided about the success of the design argument. The implication, then, is that for Hume, even the philosophical theist who erroneously believes that natural theology can arrive at an informative conception of a deity should still reject the cosmological argument as indefensible.

Cleanthes’ rejection of the argument a priori is ultimately fourfold. The first problem he suggests is a Category Mistake involved in trying to show that the existence of God is something that can be known a priori. For Hume and for Cleanthes, claims about existence are matters of fact, and matters of fact can never be demonstrated a priori. The important distinction between relations of ideas and matters of fact is that the denial of the former is inconceivable, whereas the denial of the latter is not. Hume maintains that we can always imagine a being not existing without contradiction; hence, all existential claims are matters of fact. Cleanthes finds this argument, “entirely decisive” and is “willing to rest the whole controversy upon it” (D 9.5), and it is a point Philo affirms in Part II. Hume argues similarly in the first Enquiry, maintaining that, “The non-existence of any being, without exception, is as clear and distinct an idea as its existence” (EHU 12.28). Hence, its denial is conceivable, and must be a matter of fact.

A related objection is that, since, for Hume, we can always conceive of a being not existing, there can be nothing essential about its existence. It is therefore not the type of property that can be found in a thing’s essence. Hume’s Cleanthes goes so far as to imply that the appellation “necessary existence” actually has no “consistent” meaning and therefore cannot be used in a philosophically defensible argument.

Thirdly, there is the worry mentioned above of allowing the design inference. Even if the inference is correct and we must posit a causeless being, this does not imply that this being is the deity. The inference is only to a necessary being, and for Philo, it is at least as acceptable to posit the universe as necessary in this way rather than positing an extra entity above and beyond it. This is true whether we posit a necessary being in order to stop a designer regress as above, or if we posit it to explain the contingent beings in the universe.

Finally, Hume thinks there is the dubiousness of the inference itself. A crucial premise of the argument a priori is that an infinite regress is impossible, because it violates the Principle of Sufficient Reason. However, Cleanthes takes contention with this claim. Imagine an infinitely long chain in which each event in that chain is explained through the previous members of the series. Note that in this picture, every member of the series is explained, because for any given member, there is always a prior set of members that fully explains it; but if each member of the series has been explained, then you have explained the series. It is unnecessary and inappropriate to insist on an explanation of the series as a whole. For these reasons, Hume concludes that, “The existence, therefore, of any being can only be proved by arguments from its cause or its effect” (EHU 12.29).

7. The Problem of Evil

In addition to his refutations of the arguments of natural theology, Hume gives positive reasons for rejecting a theistic deity with the Problem of Evil. Hume holds that the evidence of the Problem of Evil counts much more significantly against the theist’s case than the other objections that he raises against a designer, and it is in this area that Philo claims to “triumph” over Cleanthes. Hume’s discussion of the Problem takes place mainly in Parts X and XI of the Dialogues. The discussion is quite thorough, and includes presentations of both the Logical Problem of Evil and the Evidential Problem of Evil. Philo also considers and ultimately rejects several general approaches to solutions.

In Part X, Demea becomes Philo’s unwitting accomplice in generating the Problem of Evil. The two join together to expound an eloquent presentation of moral and natural evil, but with different motives. Demea presents evil as an obstacle that can only be surmounted with the assistance of God. Religion becomes the only escape from this brutish existence. Philo, however, raises the old problem of Epicurus, that the existence of evil is incompatible with a morally perfect and omnipotent deity. Hence, in Part X, Philo defends a version of the logical Problem. Although Philo ultimately believes that, “Nothing can shake the solidity of this reasoning, so short, so clear, so decisive”, he is “contented to retire still from this entrenchment” and, for the sake of argument, is willing to “allow, that pain or misery in man is compatible with infinite power and goodness in the deity” (D 10.34-35, Hume’s emphasis). Philo does not believe that a solution to the logical Problem of Evil is possible but, by granting this concession, he shifts the discussion to the evidential Problem in Part XI.

Hume generally presents the evidential Problem of Evil in two ways: in terms of prior probability and in terms of the likelihood of gratuitous evil. Taking them in order, Demea first hypothesizes a stranger to this world who is dropped into it and shown its miseries. Philo continues along these lines with a similar example in which someone is first shown a house full of imperfections, and is then assured that each flaw prevents a more disastrous structural flaw. For Hume, the lesson of both examples is the same. Just as the stranger to the world would be surprised to find that this world was created by a perfect being, the viewer of the house would be surprised to learn that he was considered a great or perfect architect. Philo asks, “Is the world considered in general…different from what a man…would, beforehand, expect from a very powerful, wise, and benevolent Deity?” (D 11.4, Hume’s emphasis). Since it would be surprising rather than expected, we have reason to think that a perfect creator is unlikely, and that the phenomena do not support such an inference. Moreover, pointing out that each flaw prevents a more disastrous problem does not improve matters, according to Philo.

Apart from these considerations from prior probability, Philo also argues the likelihood of gratuitous evil. To this end, Philo presents four circumstances that account for most of the natural evil in the world. Briefly, these are a) the fact that pain is used as a motivation for action, b) that the world is conducted by general laws, c) that nature is frugal in giving powers, and d) that nature is “inaccurate,” that is, more or less than the optimum level of a given phenomenon, such as rain, can and does occur. As Philo presents these sources of evil during the discussion of the evidential Problem of Evil, his point must be interpreted accordingly. In presenting these sources, all Philo needs to show is that it is likely that at least one of these circumstances could be modified so as to produce less suffering. For instance, in the third circumstance, it seems that, were humans more resistant to hypothermia, this would lead to a slightly better world. In this way, Philo bolsters the likelihood of gratuitous evil by arguing that things could easily have been better than they are.

Having presented the Problem of Evil in these ways, Hume explicitly rejects some approaches to a solution while implicitly rejecting others. First, Demea appeals to Skeptical Theism by positing a deity that is moral in ways that we cannot fathom, but Hume rebuffs this position in several ways. First, Cleanthes denies any appeal to divine mystery, insisting that we must be empiricists rather than speculative theologians. Second, Hume’s Cleanthes insists that, if we make God too wholly other, then we ultimately abandon religion. Hence, in Part XI Cleanthes presents the theist as trapped in a dilemma: either the theist anthropomorphizes the morality of the deity and, in doing so, is forced to confront the Problem of Evil, or he abandons human analogy and, thereby “abandons all religion, and retain[s] no conception of the great object of our adoration” (D 11.1). For Cleanthes, if we cannot fathom the greatness of God, then the deity cannot be an object of praise, nor can we use God to inform some notion of morality. But without these interactions, there is little left for religion to strive toward. We might add a third rejection of the skeptical theist approach: to rationally reject the Problem of Evil without providing a theodicy, we must have independent grounds for positing a good deity. However, Hume has been quite systematic in his attempts to remove these other grounds, rejecting the design and cosmological arguments earlier in the Dialogues, rejecting miracles (and therefore divine revelation) in the Enquiry, and rejecting any pragmatic justification in many works by drawing out the harms of religion. Hence, for Hume, an appeal to divine mystery cannot satisfactorily discharge the Problem of Evil.

Turning to other solutions, Hume does not consider specific theodicies in the Dialogues. Instead, he seems to take the arguments from prior probability and the four circumstances as counting against most or all of them. Going back to the house example, Hume doesn’t seem to think that pointing out that the flaws serve a purpose by preventing more disastrous consequences is sufficient to exonerate the builder. A perfect being should at least be able to reduce the number of flaws or the amount of suffering from its current state. Furthermore, recall that, in focusing on the empirical and in rejecting revealed texts, Hume would not accept any possible retreat to doctrine-specific theodicies such as appeals to the Fall Theodicy or the Satan Theodicy.

Given the amount of evil in the world, Philo ultimately holds that an indifferent deity best explains the universe. There is too much evil for a good deity, too much good for an evil deity, and too much regularity for multiple deities.

8. The Psychology of Religious Belief

Hume wrote the Dialogues roughly in tandem with another work, the Natural History. In its introduction, Hume posits that there are two types of inquiry to be made into religion: its foundations in reason and its origin in human nature. While the Dialogues investigates the former, the explicit task of the Natural History is to explore the latter. In the Natural History, he discharges the question of religion’s foundations in reason by gesturing at the design argument (and the interpretive puzzles discussed above regarding Hume’s views still apply) before focusing on his true task: how various passions give rise to vulgar or false religion.

According to Hume, all religion started as polytheistic. This was due largely to an ignorance of nature and a tendency to assign agency to things. In barbarous times, we did not have the time or ability to contemplate nature as a whole, as uniform. On account of this, we did not understand natural causes generally. In the absence of such understanding, human nature is such that we tend to assign agency to effects, since that is the form of cause and effect that we are most familiar with. This has been well documented in children who will, for instance, talk of a hammer wanting to pound nails. This is especially true of effects that seem to break regularity. Seeing two hundred pounds of meat seemingly moving in opposition to the laws of gravity, is not a miracle, but just a person walking. Primitive humans focused on these breaks in apparent regularity rather than focusing on the regularity itself. While focusing on the latter would lead us to something like a design argument, focusing on the former brings about polytheism. Irregularity can be beneficial, such as a particularly bountiful crop, or detrimental, such as a drought. Thus, on his account, as we exercise our propensity to assign agency to irregularities, a variety of effects gives rise to a variety of anthropomorphized agents. We posit deities that help us and deities that oppose us.

Eventually, Hume says, polytheism gives way to monotheism not through reason, but through fear. In our obsequious praising of these deities, motivated by fear rather than admiration, we dare not assign them limitations, and it is from this fawning praise that we arrive at a single, infinite deity who is perfect in every way, thus transforming us into monotheists. Were this monotheism grounded in reason, its adherence would be stable. Since it is not, there is “flux and reflux,” an oscillation back and forth between anthropomorphized deities with human flaws and a perfect deity. This is because, as we get farther from anthropomorphism, we make our deity insensible to the point of mysticism. Indeed, as Hume’s Cleanthes points out, this is to destroy religion. Therefore, to maintain a relatable deity, we begin to once more anthropomorphize and, when taken too far, we once more arrive at vulgar anthropomorphic polytheism.

Hume insists that monotheism, while more reasonable than polytheism, is still generally practiced in the vulgar sense; that is, as a product of the passions rather than of reason. As he repeatedly insists, the corruption of the best things lead to the worst, and monotheism has two ugly forms which Hume calls “superstition” and “enthusiasm.” Discussed in both the Natural History and the essay, “On Superstition and Enthusiasm”, both of these corrupt forms of monotheism are grounded in inappropriate passions rather than in reason. If we believe that we have invisible enemies, agents who wish us harm, then we try to appease them with rituals, sacrifices, and so forth. This gives rise to priests that serve as intermediaries and petitioners for these invisible agents. This emphasis on fear and ritual is the hallmark of Hume’s “superstition,” of which the Catholicism of his day was his main example. Superstition arises from the combination of fear, melancholy, and ignorance.

Enthusiasm, on the other hand, comes from excessive adoration. In the throes of such obsequious praise, one feels a closeness to the deity, as if one were a divine favorite. The emphasis on perceived divine selection is the hallmark of Hume’s “enthusiasm,” a view Hume saddled to many forms of Protestantism of his day. Enthusiasm thereby arises from the combination of hope, pride, presumption, imagination, and ignorance.

In this way, Hume identifies four different forms of “false” or “vulgar” religion. The first is polytheism, which he sometimes calls “idolatry.” Then there are the vulgar monotheisms, superstition, enthusiasm, and mysticism. Though Hume does not call the last a vulgar religion explicitly, he does insist that it must be faith-based, and therefore does not have a proper grounding in reason. True religion, by contrast, supports the “principles of genuine theism,” and seems to consist mainly in assigning a deity as the source of nature’s regularity. Note that this entails that breaks in reality, such as miracles, count against genuine theism rather than for it. In the Dialogues, Philo has the essence of true religion as maintaining, “that the cause or causes of order in the universe probably bear some remote analogy to human intelligence” (D 12.33). This deity is stripped of the traits that make the design analogy weak, and is further stripped of human passions as, for Philo, it would be absurd to think that the deity has human emotions, especially a need to be praised. Cleanthes, however, supplements his version of true religion by adding that the deity is “perfectly good” (D 12.24). However, because of this added moral component, Cleanthes sees religion as giving morality and order, a position that both Philo and Hume, in the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, deny. Instead, the true religion described by both Hume and Philo is independent of morality. As Yandell (1990: 29) points out, it does not superimpose new duties and motives to the moral framework. True religion does not, therefore, affect morality, and does not lead to “pernicious consequences.” In fact, it does not seem to inform our actions at all. Because true religion cannot guide our actions, Philo holds that the dispute between theists and atheists is “merely verbal.”

9. The Harms of Religion

A historian by profession, Hume spent much effort in his writings examining religion in its less savory aspects. He deplored the Crusades, and saw Great Britain torn asunder on multiple occasions over the disputes between Catholicism and Protestantism. Based on these historical consequences, Hume saw enthusiasm as affecting society like a violent storm, doing massive damage quickly before petering out. Superstition, however, he saw as a more lingering corruption, involving the invasion of governments, and so forth. Hume argued that, because both belief systems are monotheistic, both must be intolerant by their very nature. They must reject all other deities and ways of appeasing those deities, unlike polytheism which, having no fixed dogma, sits lighter on men’s minds. Generally, Hume held that religion, especially popular monotheism, does more harm than good and he thereby develops a critique of religion based on its detrimental consequences.

Yandell (1990: 283) questions the methodology of such an attack. For him, it is not clear what religion’s socio-political consequences tell us about its truth. However, if we view Hume’s attack against religion as systematic, then consequence-based critiques fulfill a crucial role. Setting aside faith-based accounts, there seem to be three ways to justify one’s belief in religion: through revealed theology, through natural theology, or via pragmatic advantage. Hume denies revealed theology, as his argument against miracles, if successful, entails the unsustainability of most divine experiences and of revealed texts. The Dialogues are his magnum opus on natural theology, working to undermine the reasonability of religion and therefore the appeal to natural theology. If these Humean critiques are successful, then the only remaining path for justifying religious belief is from a practical standpoint, that we are somehow better off for having it or for believing it. Cleanthes argues this way in Part XII of the Dialogues, insisting that corrupt religion is better than no religion at all. However, if Hume is right that religion detracts from rather than contributes to morality, and that its consequences are overall negative, then Hume has closed off this avenue as well, leaving us nothing but faith, or perhaps human nature, on which to rest our beliefs.

10. References and Further Reading

Hume wrote all of his philosophical works in English, so there is no concern about the accuracy of an English translation. For the casual reader, any edition of his work should be sufficient. However, Oxford University Press has recently begun to produce the definitive Clarendon Edition of most of his works. For the serious scholar, these are a must have, because they contain copious helpful notes about Hume’s changes in editions, and so forth. The general editor of the series is Tom L. Beauchamp.

a. Hume’s Works on Religion

  • Hume, David. A Treatise of Human Nature. Clarendon Press, Oxford, U.K., 2007, edited by David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton. (T)
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. Clarendon Press, Oxford, U.K., 2000, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp. (EHU)
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals. Reprinted in David Hume Enquiries. L.A. Selby-Bigge, Third Edition, Clarendon Press, Oxford, U.K. 2002. (EPM)
  • Hume, David. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. In David Hume Dialogues and Natural History of Religion. Oxford University Press, New York, New York, 1993. (D)
  • Hume, David. Essays: Moral, Political, and Literary. Edited by Eugene F Miller. Liberty Fund Inc., Indianapolis, Indiana, 1987. (ES)
  • Hume, David. Natural History of Religion. Reprinted in A Dissertation on the Passions, The Natural History of Religion, The Clarendon Edition of the Works of David Hume, Oxford University Press, 2007. (NHR)
  • Hume, David. New Letters of David Hume. Edited by Raymond Klibansky and Ernest C. Mossner. Oxford University Press, London, England, 1954. (NL)
  • Hume, David. The History of England. Liberty Classics, the Liberty Fund, Indianapolis, Indiana, 1983. (In six volumes) (H1-6)
  • Hume, David. The Letters of David Hume. Edited by J. Y. T. Greig, Oxford University Press, London, England, 1932. (In two volumes) (L1-2)

b. Works in the History of Philosophy

  • Broad, C. D. “Hume’s Theory of the Credibility of Miracles”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, New Series, Volume 17 (1916-1917), pages 77-94.
    • This is one of the earliest contemporary analyses of Hume’s essay on miracles. It raises objections that have become standard difficulties, such as the circularity of the Caricature Argument and the seeming incompatibility of Hume’s strong notion of the laws of nature with his previous insights about causation.
  • Butler, Ronald J. “Natural Belief and Enigma in Hume,” Archiv fur Geschichte der Philosophie. 1960, pages 73-100.
    • Butler is the first scholar to argue that religious belief, for Hume, is natural or instinctual. This would mean that, though adherence to a deity is not a product of reason, it may nevertheless be supported as doxastically appropriate. The argument itself has been roundly criticized due to problematic entailments, such as there being no atheists, but the originality of the idea makes the piece merit-worthy.
  • Coleman, Dorothy. “Baconian Probability and Hume’s Theory of Testimony.” Hume Studies, Volume 27, Number 2, November 2001, pages 195-226.
    • Coleman is an extremely careful, accurate, and charitable reader of Hume on miracles. She excels at clearing up misconceptions. In this article, she refocuses Hume’s argument from an anachronistic Pascalian/Bayesian model to a Baconian one, and argues that the “straight rule” of Earman and others is irrelevant to Hume, who insists that probability is only invoked when there has been a contrariety of phenomena.
  • Coleman, Dorothy. “Hume, Miracles, and Lotteries”. Hume Studies. Volume 14, Number 2, November 1988, pages 328-346.
    • Coleman is an extremely careful, accurate, and charitable reader of Hume on miracles. She excels at clearing up misconceptions. In this article, she responds to criticisms of Hambourger and others that Hume’s probability calculus in support of the miracles argument commits him to absurdities.
  • Earman, John. Hume’s Abject Failure—The Argument Against Miracles. Oxford University Press, New York, New York, 2000.
    • In this extremely critical work, Earman argues that the miracles argument fails on multiple levels, especially with regard to the “straight rule of induction.” The work is highly technical, interpreting Hume’s argument using contemporary probability theory.
  • Fogelin, Robert J. A Defense of Hume on Miracles. Princeton University Press, Princeton New Jersey, 2003.
    • In this book, Fogelin takes on two tasks, that of reconstructing Hume’s argument of Part X, and defending it from the recent criticisms of Johnson and Earman. He provides a novel reading in which Part I sets epistemic standards of credulity while Part II shows that miracles fall short of this standard. The subsequent defense relies heavily on this reading, and largely stands or falls based on how persuasive the reader finds Fogelin’s interpretation.
  • Garrett, Don. Cognition and Commitment in Hume’s Philosophy. Oxford University Press. New York, New York, 1997.
    • This is a great introduction to some of the central issues of Hume’s work. Garrett surveys the various positions on each of ten contentious issues in Hume scholarship, including the miracles argument, before giving his own take.
  • Gaskin, J.C.A. Hume’s Philosophy of Religion—Second Edition. Palgrave-MacMillan, 1988.
    • This is perhaps the best work on Hume’s philosophy of religion to date on account of both its scope and careful analysis. This work is one of only a few to provide an in-depth treatment of the majority of Hume’s writings on religion rather than focusing on one work. Though points of disagreement were voiced above, this should not detract from the overall caliber of Gaskin’s analysis, which is overall fair, careful, and charitable. The second edition is recommended because, in addition to many small improvements, there are significant revisions involving Philo’s Reversal.
  • Geisler, Norman L. “Miracles and the Modern Mind”, in In Defense of Miracles- A Comprehensive Case of God’s Action in History, edited by Douglas Geivett and Gary R. Habermas, InterVarsity Press, Downers Grove, Illinois, 1997, pages 73-85.
    • In this article, Geisler raises an important worry that Hume cannot draw a principled distinction between the miraculous and the merely marvelous. Since this is the case, then Hume must reject the marvelous as well, but this would have the disastrous consequence of stagnating science.
  • Hambourger, Robert. “Belief in Miracles and Hume’s Essay.” Nous. N 80; 14: 587-604.
    • In this essay, Hambourger lays out a problem known as the lottery paradox, in which he tries to show that a commitment to Humean probabilistic doxastic assent leads to counterintuitive consequences.
  • Holden, Thomas. Spectres of False Divinity. Oxford University Press, Oxford, U.K., 2010.
    • In this careful work, Holden argues that Hume goes beyond mere skepticism to “moral atheism,” the view that the deity cannot have moral attributes. He gives a valid argument supporting this and shows how Hume supports each premise, drawing on a wide variety of texts.
  • Huxley, Thomas Henry. Hume. Edited by John Morley, Dodo Press, U.K., 1879.
    • Huxley is an early commentator on Hume, and this work is the first to raise several worries with Hume’s miracles argument.
  • Johnson, David. Hume, Holism, and Miracles. Cornell University Press, Ithaca, New York, 1999.
    • This is another recent critique of Hume’s account of miracles. Johnson’s work is more accessible than Earman’s, and it is novel in the sense that it addresses several different historical and contemporary reconstructions of Hume’s argument.
  • Kemp Smith, Norman. (ed.) Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. The Bobbs-Merrill Company, Inc., Indianapolis, Indiana, 1947.
    • In Kemp Smith’s edition of Hume’s Dialogues, he provides extensive interpretation and commentary, including his argument that Hume is represented entirely by Philo and that seeming evidence to the contrary is building stylistic “dramatic balance.”
  • Levine, Michael. Hume and the Problem of Miracles: A Solution. Kluwer Academic Publishers, Dordrecht, Netherlands, 1989.
    • Levine argues that Hume’s miracles argument cannot be read independently of his treatment of causation, and that the two are inconsistent. Nevertheless, a Humean argument can be made against belief in the miraculous.
  • Livingston, Donald W. Hume’s Philosophy of Common Life. University of Chicago Press, Chicago, Illinois, 1984.
    • This is one of the standard explications of Humean causal realism. It stresses Hume’s position that philosophy should conform to and explain common beliefs rather than conflict with them. It is included here because, in the course of his project, Livingston includes a helpful discussion of Humean laws of nature.
  • Paley, William. A View of the Evidences of Christianity, in The Works of William Paley, Edinburgh, 1830.
    • Paley is the first to attribute the Caricature Argument to Hume.
  • Pike, Nelson. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Bobbs-Merrill Company Inc., Indianapolis, IN, 1970.
    • In Pike’s edition of Hume’s Dialogues, he provides extensive interpretation and commentary, as well as a text-based critique of Kemp Smith’s position.
  • Penelhum, Terence. “Natural Belief and Religious Belief in Hume’s Philosophy.” The Philosophical Quarterly, Volume 33, Number 131, 1983.
    • Penelhum previously offered a careful argument that some form of religious belief, for Hume, is natural. However, unlike Butler, he is not committed to the view that religious beliefs are irresistible and necessary for daily life. In this more recent work, he confronts some difficulties with the view and updates his position.
  • Swinburne, Richard. The Concept of Miracle. Macmillan, St. Martin’s Press, London, U.K., 1970.
    • Though Swinburne is generally critical of Hume’s position, he is a careful and astute reader. In this general defense of miracles, his reconstruction and critique of Hume is enlightening.
  • Tweyman, Stanley. "Scepticism and Belief in Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion." International Archives of the History of Ideas, Martinus Nyhoff Publishers, 1986.
    • Tweyman presents a holistic reading of the Dialogues, starting with a dogmatic Cleanthes who is slowly exposed to skeptical doubt, a doubt that must ultimately be corrected by the common life. Tweyman ultimately argues that belief in a designer is natural for Hume.
  • Wieand, Jeffery. “Pamphilus in Hume’s Dialogues”, The Journal of Religion, Volume 65, Number 1, January 1985, pages 33-45.
    • Wieand is one of the few recent scholars that argues against Hume as Philo and for a Hume as Cleanthes/Pamphilus view. This interpretation focuses largely on the role of the narrator and Pamphilus’ discussion about the dialogue form.
  • Yandell, Keith E. Hume’s “Inexplicable Mystery”—His Views on Religion. Temple University Press, Philadelphia, Pennsylvania, 1990.
    • Apart from Gaskin, Yandell’s work is the only other major comprehensive survey of Hume on religion. The work is highly technical and highly critical, and is sometimes more critical than accurate. However, he at least provides the general form of some theistic responses to Hume and identifies a few important lapses on Hume’s part, such as a lack of response to religious experience.
  • Yoder, Timothy S. Hume on God. Continuum International Publishing, New York, New York, 2008.
    • Yoder’s text is an extended argument, defending Hume’s “amoral theism”. He makes important contributions in his treatment of false/vulgar religion, the background for English deism, and Hume’s use of irony.


Author Information

C. M. Lorkowski
Email: clorkows@kent.edu
Kent State University- Trumbull Campus
U. S. A.

Rights and Obligations of Parents

Historically, philosophers have had relatively little to say about the family. This is somewhat surprising, given the pervasive presence and influence of the family upon both individuals and social life. Most philosophers who have addressed issues related to the parent-child relationship—Kant and Aristotle, for example—have done so in a fairly terse manner. At the end of the twentieth century, this changed. Contemporary philosophers have begun to explore, in a substantial way, a range of issues connected with the rights and obligations of parents. For example, if there are parental rights, what is their foundation? Most contemporary philosophers reject the notion that children are there parents' property and thus reject the notions that parents have rights to their children and over their children. Some philosophers argue for a biological basis of parental rights, while others focus on the best interests of children or a social contract as the grounds of such rights. Still others reject outright the notion that parents have rights, as parents. Some do so because of skepticism about the structure of the putative rights of parents, while others reject the idea of parental rights in view of the nature and extent of the rights of children.

The claim that parents have obligations, as parents, is less controversial. Nevertheless, there is disagreement about the basis of such obligations. Apart from biological, best interests, and social contract views, there is also the causal view of parental obligations, which includes the claim that those who bring a child into existence are thereby obligated to care for that child. Philosophers are concerned not merely with these theoretical questions related to parental rights and obligations; they also focus their attention on practical questions in this realm of human life. There are many distinct positions to consider with respect to medical decision making, the autonomy of children, child discipline, the licensing of parents, and the propriety of different forms of moral, political, and religious upbringing of children. While both the theoretical and practical aspects of the rights and obligations of parents are receiving increased attention, there remains much room for substantial work to be done on this important topic.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Philosophical Accounts of Parental Rights and Obligations
    1. Proprietarianism
    2. Biology
    3. Best Interests of the Child
    4. Constructionism
    5. Causation
    6. Fundamental Interests of Parents and Children
  3. Skepticism about Parental Rights and Obligations
    1. Children’s Liberation
    2. The Myth of Parental Rights
  4. Applied Parental Ethics
    1. Parental Licensing
    2. The Child’s Right to an Open Future
    3. Medical Decision Making
    4. Disciplining Children
    5. The Religious Upbringing of Children
    6. Parental Love
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

What is a parent? The answer one gives to this question will likely include, either implicitly or explicitly, particular assumptions about the grounds of parental rights and obligations. Parenthood and biological parenthood are often seen as synonymous. But of course, adoptive parents are also parents by virtue of assuming the parental role. This commonsense fact opens the door for a consideration not only of the possible connections between biology and parenthood, but other issues as well, such as the role of consent in acquiring parental rights and obligations, which then leads to a host of other questions that are not only theoretically important, but existentially significant as well. What does it mean for a parent to possess rights, as a parent? Why think that such rights exist? What obligations do parents have to their children? What is the role of the state, if any, concerning the parent-child relationship? These questions are central for our understanding of the moral, social, personal, and political dimensions of the parent-child relationship.

2. Philosophical Accounts of Parental Rights and Obligations

When considering the rights of parents, both positive and negative rights are involved. A negative right is a right of non-interference, such as the right to make medical decisions on behalf of one’s child without intervention from the state. A positive right in this context is a right to have the relevant interests one has as a parent in some way promoted by the state. For example, some argue that parents have a right to maternity and paternity leave, funded in part or whole by the state. Regarding parental obligations, the focus in what follows will be on moral obligations, rather than legal ones, with a few exceptions. A parent might have a moral obligation to her child to provide her with experiences such as musical education or opportunities to participate in sports that enrich her life, without being legally bound to do so. In this section, the various accounts of the grounds of the moral rights and obligations of parents will be discussed.

a. Proprietarianism

An advocate of proprietarianism holds that children are the property of their parents, and that this serves to ground parental rights (and perhaps obligations). Proprietarianists argue, given that parents in some sense produce their children, that children are the property of their parents in some sense of the term.. Aristotle held this type of view, insofar as he takes children and slaves to be property of the father (Nicomachean Ethics, 1134b). At least one contemporary philosopher, Jan Narveson, has argued that children are the property of their parents, and that this grounds parental rights. This does not relieve parents of having obligations regarding their children even though children do not yet possess rights (Narveson 1988). For Narveson, how parents treat their children is limited by how that treatment impacts other rights-holders. Nevertheless, parents have the right to direct the lives of their children, because they exerted themselves as producers, bringing children into existence. A different sort of proprietarianism centers on the idea that parents own themselves, including their genetic material, and since children are a product of that material it follows that parents have rights over their genetic offspring. Critics of proprietarianism primarily reject it on the grounds that it is immoral to conceive of children as property. Children are human beings, and as such, cannot rightly be owned by other human beings. It follows from this that children are not the property of their parents. Most contemporary philosophers reject proprietarianism.

Historically, proprietarianism is often connected with absolutism, which is the idea that parental authority over children is in an important sense, limitless. Absolutists held that fathers have the right to decide whether or not their child lives or dies. This view is no longer advocated in the contemporary philosophical literature, of course, but in the past was thought by some that this extreme level of parental authority was morally justified. Some advocates of this view thought that because a child is the creation of the parent, that absolutism follows. Other reasons offered in support of this view include the notion that both divine and natural law grant such authority to parents; this level of authority fosters moral development in the young by preventing them from exemplifying vice; and the idea that the family is a model of the commonwealth, such that as children obey their father, they will also learn to obey the commonwealth (Bodin 1576/1967). According to Bodin The natural affection that fathers have towards their children will prevent them from abusing their authority,. Critics of absolutism reject it for reasons similar to those offered against proprietarianism. They claim that is clearly immoral to grant parents the power to end the lives of their children. While some absolutists seek to ground this power in the fact that the parent created the child in question, critics argue that the possession and exercise of this power over one’s children simply does not follow from the fact that one created those children.

b. Biology

Is a biological relationship between a parent and child necessary or sufficient for parenthood? That is, does biology in some sense ground the rights and obligations of parents? Two types of biological accounts of parenthood have emerged which are more detailed than those which emphasize the general value of biology in the parent-child relationship. Advocates of the first type emphasize the genetic connection between parent and child, while advocates of the second take gestation to be crucial. The advocates of the genetic account believe that the genetic connection between parent and child grounds parenthood. The fact that a particular child is derived from the genetic material of an individual or is “tied by blood” to that individual is what yields parental rights and obligations. A person has rights and obligations with respect to a particular child insofar as that person and the child share the requisite DNA. Historically speaking, perceived blood ties have been decisive in the transfer of wealth, property, and power from one generation to the next.

Critics of genetic accounts claim that several of the arguments advanced for these accounts are flawed in important ways. For instance, those who hold that the genetic connection is necessary for parental rights and obligations must deal with counterexamples to the claim, such as adoptive parenthood and step-parenthood. In addition, if two adults who are identical twins have the same level of genetic connection to a child it does not follow that both are that child’s mother or father, though at least some genetic accounts would seem committed to such a view.

Gestational accounts of parental rights and obligations, in their strongest from, include the claim that gestation is necessary for parental rights. On this view, men only acquire parental rights and obligations via marriage, the gestational mother consenting to co-parenthood with the male, or by the mother allowing him to adopt her child. Some gestational accounts—including those which only include the claim that gestation is sufficient for parental rights or gives the mother a prima facie claim to such rights—focus on the risk, effort, and discomfort that gestational mothers undergo as that which grounds their claims to parenthood. Others center on the intimacy that obtains and the attachment which occurs during gestation between the mother and child as the basis for a claim to parenthood. A final type of gestationalism is consequentialist, insofar as advocates of this view hold that when there is a conflict concerning custody between gestational and genetic mothers, a social and legal policy favoring gestational mother will have more favorable consequences for mothers and their children. It is argued that an emphasis on gestation, and preference for gestational mothers in such cases, would increase women’s social standing by emphasizing their freedom to make such choices concerning health on behalf of themselves and their children. This in turn will have the likely result of benefitting the health and welfare of such mothers and their children. Positive inducements are preferable to punitive sanctions, given the positive consequences of the former. This view also implies that the claims to parenthood of gestational mothers carry more weight than those of fathers, at least when disputes over custody arise.

Critics of gestationalism reply that it is objectionably counterintuitive, insofar as it is inconsistent with the belief that mothers and fathers have equal rights and obligations regarding their children. Many of the goods available to individuals via parenthood, including intimacy, meaning, and satisfaction that can be obtained or acquired in the parent-child relationship, are equally available to both mothers and fathers. This equality of parental interests, then, is thought to justify the conclusion that the presumptive claims to parenthood on the parts of mothers and fathers are equal in weight.

There is a more general issue concerning the relationship between biology and parenthood, which has to do with the value of biological connections in the parent-child relationship. A particularly strong view concerning the relationship between biology and parenthood is that biology is essential to the value of parenthood for human beings (Page 1984). On this view, there is a necessary connection between biology and parental rights. The entire process of creating, bearing, and rearing a child is thought to be a single process which is valuable to parents insofar as they seek to create a person who in some sense reflects a part of themselves. The aim is to create someone else in the image of the parent. This is why being a parent has value for us; it is why we desire it. In reply, it has been argued that while biology may have value for many people with respect to the parent-child relationship, a biological connection is neither necessary nor sufficient for parental rights and obligations. Rather, the more valuable aspects of the parent-child relationship are personal, social, and moral. It has been argued that biological ties between parents and children are morally significant in other ways (Velleman 2005). Some believe that children have families in the most important sense of the term if they will be raised by parents who want them, love them, and desire what is best for them, regardless of whether a biological connection exists. The lack of such a connection does little harm to children in such families. Against this, Velleman argues that knowledge of one’s biological relatives, especially one’s parents, is crucial because the self-knowledge one gains from knowing them is central for forging a meaningful human life. Lack of such knowledge, then, is harmful to children. In reply, it has been argued that knowledge of one’s biological progenitors is unnecessary for self-knowledge and for having and leading a good life (Haslanger 2009).

c. Best Interests of the Child

According to this account of parenthood, children ought to be raised by a parent or parents who will best serve their interests. On this account, parental rights are grounded in the ability of parents to provide the best possible context for childrearing. While the best interests criterion of parenthood is useful in cases of conflicting claims to custody in the context of divorce or in situations where child abuse and neglect are present, several criticisms have emerged with respect to its application as the fundamental grounding of parental rights and obligations. One criticism of this view is that it fails to sufficiently take into account the interests of parents, which leads to potential counterexamples. For instance, consider a case in which it is in the best interests of a child to be raised by an aunt or uncle, rather than the child’s biological or custodial parents, when the current parents are fit and fulfilling their obligations to the child in question. Removing the child from the custody of those parents solely on the basis of the comparative superiority of others seems problematic to many. Moreover, this account may entail that the state should remove newborns from the custody of their parents, if they are poor, and transfer parental rights to someone who has greater financial stability, all else being equal. For critics of the best interests account, this is deeply counterintuitive and is sufficient for rejecting this account of parenthood.

Perhaps the account can be modified to deal with such criticisms. The modified account need not entail that a child should be removed from the custody of its natural parents and given to better caretakers, who then possess parental rights with respect to that child, even if these caretakers possess the same nationality, ethnicity, and social origins. This is because it is in the best interests of the child to maintain her developing self-identity and provide her with a stable environment. Still, a primary objection to all best-interests accounts is that they fail to take into account, in an adequate manner, the relevant interests of a child’s current parents. The point is not that parental interests trump the interests of the child, but rather that best interests of the child accounts fail to weigh those interests in a proper manner.

d. Constructionism

Some philosophers argue that the rights and obligations of parenthood are not grounded in biology or a natural relationship between parents and their offspring. Rather, they hold that the rights and obligations of parents are social constructs. One form of this view includes the claim that parenthood is a type of social contract. Advocates of such a view argue that the rights and responsibilities of parenthood arise from a social agreement between the prospective parent and the moral community (such as the state) that appoints the prospective parent to be the actual parent. In some cases, social contract accounts emphasize causation (see section e. below) as a way in which individuals may implicitly consent to taking on the rights and responsibilities of parenthood. Contractual and causal accounts can come apart, however, and be treated separately. It has also been argued that social conventions have priority over biological ties when determining who will raise a child, and that in social contexts where biological parents generally have the duty to raise their offspring, individual responsibility for children is produced by the choice to undertake the duties of raising a child, which can occur by deciding to procreate or deciding not to avoid parental obligations via abortion or adoption.

Others who take parenthood to be a social construct emphasize the individual choice to undertake the rights and responsibilities of parenthood with respect to a particular child. This way of incurring special obligations is familiar. For instance, an employer takes on special obligations to another when that person becomes her employee. Spouses take on special obligations to one another and acquire certain rights with respect to each other via marriage. In these and many other instances, one acquires particular rights and obligations by choice, or voluntary consent. Similarly, then, when an individual voluntarily undertakes the parental role, that individual acquires parental rights and obligations. This can happen via intentional procreation, adoption, and step-parenthood.

Critics of constructionism argue that advocates of this view fail to appreciate certain facts of human nature related to the interests of children. Many constructionists, according to their critics, tend to weigh the interests of adults more heavily than those of the relevant children. They maintain that children have deep and abiding interests in being raised by their biological progenitors, or at least having significant relationships with them. Intentionally creating children who will lack such connections seems problematic, and some critics are especially concerned about intentionally creating children who will lack either a custodial mother or father. Other versions of constructionism are not vulnerable to this critique, insofar as they include the claim that children’s interests and in some cases rights are at least equally important relative to the rights and interests of adults.

Related to the use of reproductive technology, the creation of a child by gamete donors is thought by some to be immoral or at least morally problematic because such donors often fail to take their obligations to their genetic offspring seriously enough when they transfer them to the child’s custodial parents. Given that parental obligations include more than just minimal care, but also seeking to care for children in deeper ways which foster their flourishing, the claim is that in such cases donors do not take their obligations as seriously as is warranted. Constructionists reply that as long as the custodial parents nurture and provide sufficient care for children, the biological connections as well as the presence of both a mother and father are at least relatively, if not entirely, insignificant. In order to resolve these issues, both philosophical argumentation and empirical data are important.

e. Causation

Most, if not all, contemporary philosophers who defend a causal account of parenthood focus on parental obligations rather than rights. Simply stated, the claim is that individuals have special obligations to those offspring which they cause to come into existence. Defenders of the causal account argue that genetic and gestational parents incur moral obligations to their offspring in virtue of their causal role concerning the existence of the children in question. In many cases, of course, the causal parents of a child would incur obligations because they voluntarily consent to take on such when they choose to have a child. Defenders of the causal account often focus on cases in which procreation is not intentional, in order to isolate the causal role as being sufficient for the generation of parental obligations.

Advocates of the causal account set aside cases such as rape, where coercion is present. They maintain that in other important cases one can incur obligations to offspring, even if one does not intend to procreate or consent to take on such obligations. The general idea is that when a person voluntarily engages in a behavior which can produce reasonably foreseeable consequences, and the agent is a proximate and primary cause of those consequences, then it follows that the agent has obligations with respect to those consequences. In the case of procreation, the child needs care. To fail to provide it is to allow harmful consequences to obtain. Since the agent is causally responsible for the existence of a child in need of care, then the agent is morally responsible to provide it. This is similar to other situations in which an agent is causally responsible for harm or potential harm and is thereby thought to also bear moral responsibility relative to that harm. For instance, if a person damages his neighbor’s property via some action, then that person thereby incurs the moral responsibility to compensate his neighbor for that damage. By parity of reasoning, defenders of the causal account of parental obligations argue that causal responsibility for the existence of a child—when coercion is not present—entails moral responsibility with respect to preventing the child’s experiencing various kinds of suffering and harm.

The heart of the disagreement between proponents of the causal account and their critics is whether or not the voluntary acceptance of the special obligations of parenthood is necessary for incurring those obligations. Critics of the causal account argue that it is difficult to isolate parents as those who bear causal responsibility for a child’s existence, given the causal roles others play (such as medical practitioners). Given the variety of individuals that are causally connected to the existence of a particular child, the connections between causal responsibility and moral responsibility in this particular realm of life are unclear. A defense of the causal account against this objection includes the claim that the interests of children are in play here and deeply connected with the causal parents and not medical practitioners. This may be a hybrid account however, coupling causation with an interests-based account of parental obligation, which is the focus of the next section.

f. Fundamental Interests of Parents and Children

This view of parenthood focuses on fundamental interests—those which are crucial for human flourishing—as the grounds for the rights and obligations of parents. The general picture is a familiar one in which such interests generate correlative rights and obligations. In the parent-child relationship, there are several such interests in play, including psychological well-being, the forging and maintenance of intimate relationships, and the freedom to pursue that which brings satisfaction and meaning to life. The interests of children connected with their custodial parents are numerous and significant. If a child receives caring, intimate, and focused attention from a parent, this can help her to become an autonomous agent capable of pursuing and enjoying intimate relationships and psychological and emotional health. It can also contribute to her having the ability to create and pursue valuable ends in life. The lack of such attention and care often has very detrimental effects on the development and life prospects of a child. These interests are thought to generate the obligations of parenthood.

How is it that these interests are thought to generate parental rights? Parents can experience meaning and satisfaction in life via the various actions related to parenting, as they offer care, guidance, and knowledge to their children. By playing a role in satisfying the fundamental interests of their children, parents have many of their own interests satisfied, including the ones mentioned above: psychological well-being, the forging and maintenance of intimate relationships, and experiencing satisfaction with and meaning in life. It is important for interests-based accounts of parental rights to note that a condition for the satisfaction of the relevant interests often requires that the parent-child relationship be relatively free from intrusion. If the state exercises excessive control in this realm of human life, the parent becomes a mediator of the will of the state and many of the goods of parenthood then are lost. The parent is not making as significant of a personal contribution to the well-being of her child as she might otherwise be able to do, and so is not able to achieve some of the goods that more autonomous parenting makes possible, including intimacy in the parent-child relationship. There are certainly cases in which intrusion is warranted, such as instances of abuse and neglect, but in these types of cases there is no longer a genuine intimacy present to be threatened, given that abuse blocks relational intimacy. Finally, defenders of this view of parenthood conclude that if children need parental guidance and individualized attention based on an intimate knowledge of their preferences and dispositions, then the state has an interest in refraining from interfering in that relationship until overriding conditions obtain. Parents have rights, as parents, to this conditional freedom from intrusion.

3. Skepticism about Parental Rights and Obligations

a. Children’s Liberation

Advocates of children’s liberation hold that parents should have no rights over children because such paternal control is an unjustified inequality; it is both unnecessary and immoral. Those who support children’s liberation argue that children should possess the same legal and moral status as adults. This entails that children should be granted the same rights and freedoms that adults possess, such as self-determination, voting, and sexual autonomy, as well as the freedom to select guardians other than their parents. While advocates of liberationism disagree on the particular rights that children should be granted, they agree that the status quo regarding paternalism with respect to children is unjust. Clearly such a view is a challenge to the legal and moral status of parents. One argument in favor of this view focuses on the consistency problem. If rights are grounded in the possession of certain capacities, then it follows that when an individual has the relevant capacities—such as autonomy—then that individual should possess the rights in question. Consistency may require either denying certain rights to particular adults who do not possess the relevant capacities in order to preserve paternalistic control of children, or granting full human rights to particular children who possess the relevant capacities. Alternatively, it has been suggested that children should be granted all of the rights possessed by adults, even if they do not yet possess the relevant capacities (Cohen 1980). Rather than being left to themselves to exercise those rights, children could borrow the capacities they lack from others who are obligated to help them secure their rights and who possess the relevant capacities. Once children actualize these capacities, they may then act as agents on their own behalf. The upshot is that a difference in capacities does not justify denying rights to children.

Critics of children’s liberation argue that paternalistic treatment of children enables them to develop their capacities and become autonomous adults with the attendant moral and legal status. They also worry that in a society in which children are liberated in this way, many will forego education and other goods which are conducive to and sometimes necessary for their long-term welfare. It has also been suggested that limiting children’s right of self-determination fosters their development and protects them from exploitative employment. Granting equal rights to children might also prevent parents from providing the moral training children need, and cause adolescents to be even less likely to consider seriously the guidance offered by their parents. In addition, critics point out that autonomy is not the only relevant issue with respect to granting equal rights to children. The capacity for moral behavior is also important, and should be taken into account given the facts of moral development related to childhood. Finally, if a child possesses the relevant actualized capacities, then perhaps theoretical consistency requires that she be granted the same moral and legal status accorded to adults. However, the critic of children’s liberation may hold that this is simply a case where theory and practice cannot coincide due to the practical barriers in attempting to bring the two together. Perhaps the best way in which to bring theory and practice together is to emphasize the moral obligations of parents to respect the developed and developing autonomy and moral capacities of their children.

b. The Myth of Parental Rights

It has been argued that parents do not possess even a qualified or conditional moral right to impact the lives of their children in significant ways (Montague 2000). The reason that Montague rejects the notion of parental rights is that such rights lack two essential components of moral rights. First, moral rights are oriented towards their possessors. Second, moral rights have a discretionary character. Since the putative rights of parents have neither of these features, such rights should be rejected. If there were parental rights, their function would be to protect either the interests that parents have or the choices they make regarding the parent-child relationship. The problem for the proponent of parental rights is that no other right shares a particular feature of such rights, namely, that the relevant set of interests or autonomy is only worth protecting because of the value of protecting the interests or autonomy of others. Moreover, Montague argues that parental rights to care for children are in tension with parental obligations to do so. The notion of parental rights is in tension with the fact that parents are obligated to protect their children’s interests and assist them in the process of developing into autonomous individuals. Practically speaking, an emphasis on parental rights focuses on what is good for parents, while a focus on parental obligations emphasizes the well-being of children. He concludes that we have strong reasons for rejecting the notion that parents have a right to impact, in a significant way, the lives of their children. So, the view is that parental rights are incompatible with parental obligations. Parents have discretion regarding how to fulfill their obligations, but they do not have such discretion regarding whether to do so. If there were parental rights, parents would have discretion regarding whether to protect and promote the interests of their children, and this is unacceptable. In reply, one critic of Montague’s argument) has pointed out that while it is true that parents do not have discretion regarding what counts as fulfilling their obligations towards their children, they nevertheless have discretion regarding how to do so, and perhaps this is sufficient for thinking that there are some parental rights (Austin 2007).

4. Applied Parental Ethics

While the vast majority of philosophers agree that children have at least some rights—such as the right to life, for example—the extent of those rights and how they relate to the rights and obligations of parents is an issue that generates much controversy. The existence and extent of parental rights, the rights of children, and the relevant interests of the state all come together when one considers issues in applied parental ethics. The theoretical conception of rights one holds as well as one’s view of the comparative strength of those rights will often inform what one takes to be the personal, social, and public policy implications with respect to these issues.

a. Parental Licensing

Hugh LaFollette’s defense of the claim that the state should license parents is perhaps the most influential and widely discussed version of the philosophical argument in favor of parental licensing (LaFollette 1980).  LaFollette argues that (i) if an activity is potentially harmful to others; (ii) requires a certain level of competence; and (iii) this competence can be demonstrated via a reliable test, then the activity in question should be regulated by the state. These criteria justify current licensing programs. For instance, we require that physicians obtain medical licenses from the state to ensure their competency due to the potential harm caused by medical malpractice. In order to drive an automobile, a level of skill must be demonstrated because of the potential harm to others that can be done by incompetent drivers. These criteria also apply to parenting. It is clear that parents can harm their children through abuse, neglect, and lack of love, which often results in physical and psychological trauma. Children who suffer such harms may become adults who are neither well-adjusted nor happy, which can lead to cyclical patterns of abuse and other negative social consequences. Parenting also requires a certain competency that many people lack due to temperament, ignorance, lack of energy, and psychological instability. LaFollette believes that we can create a moderately reliable psychological test that will identify those individuals who will likely abuse or neglect their children. At the time of his paper, such tests were just beginning to be formulated. Since then, however, accurate parenting tests have been developed which could serve as useful tools for identifying individuals who are likely to be extremely bad parents (McFall 2009). Given that parenting is potentially harmful and requires competence that can be demonstrated via a reliable test, by parity of reasoning the state should also require licenses for parents. Moreover, given that we screen adoptive parents and require that they demonstrate a level of competence before they are allowed to adopt a child in order to reduce the chances of abuse or neglect, there is no compelling reason not to require the same of biological parents. The aim of parental licensing is not to pick out parents who will be very good, but rather to screen those who will likely be very bad by abusing or neglecting their children. The intent is to prevent serious harm to children, as well as the harms others suffer because of the social impact of child abuse. LaFollette concludes that since a state program for licensing parents is desirable, justifiable, and feasible, it follows that we should implement such a program.

Critics argue that there are both theoretical and practical problems with such proposals. Some worry about cases where a woman is pregnant before acquiring a license and fails to obtain one before giving birth. The picture of the state removing a newborn infant in such cases and transferring custody to suitable adoptive parents is problematic because no abuse or neglect has yet occurred. A variety of alternatives, including less invasive licensing as well as non-licensing alternatives, have been proposed. LaFollette himself puts forth the possibility that instead of prohibiting unlicensed parents from raising children, the state could offer tax incentives for licensed parents and other types of interventions, such as scrutiny by protective services of unlicensed parents, on the condition that such measures would provide adequate protection for children. Others have proposed different requirements for a parental license, with both fewer and greater restrictions than those proposed by LaFollette. These include minimum and maximum age requirements, mandatory parenting education, signing a contract in which a parent agrees to care for and not maltreat his or her child (so that if a child is maltreated, removal of the child would be based on a breach of contract rather than criminal liability), financial requirements, and cognitive requirements. Others argue for alternatives to licensing, such as mandatory birth control, extended (and perhaps paid) maternity and paternity leave, and universal daycare provided by the government.

Finally, some argue that legally mandated family monitoring and counseling is preferable to a program of licensing parents because it better accounts for the interests people have in becoming and being parents and the welfare of children. It is also claimed to be preferable to licensing because it avoids the possible injustices that may occur given the fallibility of any test aimed at predicting human behavior. If people who are or will soon be parents can develop as parents, it is better to give them the opportunity to do so under close supervision, monitoring, and counseling, allowing them to be with their children when they are young and a significant amount of bonding occurs. This practice would protect the interests of children, society, and parents. For those parents whose incompetence is severe or who fail to deal with their incompetence in a satisfactory manner, the monitoring/counseling proposal rightly prevents them from raising children, according to advocates of this approach.

b. The Child’s Right to an Open Future

A significant concept shaping much of the debate concerning the ethics of childrearing is that of the child’s right to an open future (Feinberg 1980). According to this argument, children have a right to have their options kept open until they become autonomous and are able to decide among those options for themselves, according to their own preferences. Parents violate the child’s right to an open future when they ensure that certain options will be closed to the child when she becomes an autonomous adult. For example, a parent who is overly directive concerning the religious views of her child, or who somehow limits the career choices of her child is violating this right. When parents violate this right, they are violating the autonomy rights of the adult that the child will become. According to Feinberg, parents are obligated to offer their children as much education as is feasible, as this will enable them to choose from a maximally broad range of potential life options upon reaching adulthood. When parents do engage in more directive parenting, they should do so in the preferred directions of the child, or at least not counter to those preferences. In this way, parents respect the preferences and autonomy of their children, allowing them to exercise their rights in making significant choices in life that are in line with their own natural preferences.

One direct criticism of Feinberg’s view includes the observation that steering one’s child toward particular options in the context of parenthood is unavoidable (Mills 2003). According to Mills, there are three options relative to the future which parents may choose from as they determine how directive they ought to be. First, as Feinberg claims, parents may provide their children with a maximally open future. Second, parents may direct their children toward a future which the parents value and endorse. Third, parents may opt for a compromise between these two options. Whether or not one considers some particular set of options to be open is connected to one’s perspective. Given this, one’s judgment concerning whether or not a particular child has an open future is also connected to that perspective. For instance, someone outside of the Amish community would likely contend that children in that community do not have an open future; by virtue of being Amish, careers in medicine, science, and technology are closed to such children. Yet from an Amish perspective, children have a variety of options including farming, blacksmithing, woodworking, etc. Rather than speaking of an option as open or closed, Mills argues that we should think of options as encouraged, discouraged, fostered, or inhibited. Practically speaking, in order to encourage a child toward or away from some option in life, other options must be closed down.  Finally, Mills criticizes Feinberg’s view on the grounds that it places more value on the future life of the child, rather than the present.

c. Medical Decision Making

Many are concerned about state intervention in medical decision making as it is performed by parents on behalf of their children. Most would agree that the interests of all relevant parties, including children, parents, and the state, must be taken into account when making medical decisions on behalf of children. The worry is that state intrusion into this arena is an improper invasion of family privacy. And yet among those who generally agree that such decisions should be left to parents, the claim is not that parents have absolute authority to make such decisions on behalf of their children. Given the weight of the interests and rights at issue, exceptions to parental autonomy are usually made at least in cases where the life of the child is at stake, on the grounds that the right to life trumps the right to privacy, when those rights come into conflict. While some parents may have religious reasons for foregoing certain kinds of medical treatment with respect to their children, it is controversial to say the least that parental rights to the exercise of religion are strong enough to trump a child’s right to life. According to some, the state, in its role of parens patriae, can legitimately intervene on behalf of children in many such cases. The courts have done so in cases where the illness or injury in question is life-threatening and yet a child’s parents refuse treatment. In less serious cases, the state has been more reluctant to intervene. However, the state’s interest in healthy children is apparently leading to a greater willingness to intervene in less drastic cases as well (Foreman and Ladd 1996).

A different set of issues arises with respect to medical decision making as it applies to procreative decisions, both those that are now available and those that for now are mere future possibilities. With respect to the former, it is now possible for parents to engage in attempted gender selection. An increasing number of couples are using reproductive technologies to select the sex of their children. One technique for making such a selection involves using the process of in vitro fertilization and then testing the embryos at three days of age for the desired sex. Those that are the preferred sex are then implanted in the womb and carried to term. Another technology which can be employed by couples who are seeking to select the sex of their children is sperm sorting.  Female-producing sperm and male-producing sperm are separated, and then the woman is artificially inseminated with the sperm of the desired sex.  This is easier and less expensive, though not as reliable, as the in vitro procedure.

Parents might have a variety of reasons for seeking to determine the gender of their offspring, related to the gender of their current children, family structure, or other preferences which relate to this. One criticism of this practice is that it transforms children into manufactured products, which we design rather than receive. That is, children become the result, at least in part, of a consumer choice which is thought by some to be problematic in this context. In addition, this practice is thought by some to place too much weight on the desires of parents related to the traits of their (future) children. Ideally, at least, parental love for children is to be unconditional, but in cases where parents choose the gender of their offspring it may be that their love is already contingent upon the child having a certain trait or traits. Finally, given the scarcity of resources in health care, some argue that we should employ those resources in other less frivolous areas of medical care. Similar worries are raised with respect to the future use of human cloning technology. The technology would likely be costly to develop and deploy. And if such a technology comes into existence, parents may be able to select beforehand a wide variety of traits, which could also undermine morally and psychologically significant aspects of the parent-child relationship, in the view of some critics.

d. Disciplining Children

There are a variety of ways in which parents discipline or punish their children. These include corporal forms of punishment, and other forms such as time-outs, loss of privileges, fines, and verbal corrections. Of these, corporal forms of punishment are the most controversial.

Critics of corporal punishment offer many reasons for thinking that it is both immoral and a misguided practice. The use of violence and aggression is taken by many to be wrong in the context of the parent-child relationship, which they believe should be characterized by intimacy and love with no place for the infliction of physical pain. It is thought that children may learn that violence, or inflicting pain, is a permissible way to attempt to control others. Some argue that reasoning with the child and other forms of verbal and moral persuasion are more effective, as are alternative forms of discipline and punishment such as verbal reprimands or time outs. Others believe that the negative effects on children of corporal punishment are often compounded or confused by other forms of maltreatment that are also present, such as parental expressions of disgust towards the child. This makes determining the effects of the punishment itself difficult. Still others think there is a place for corporal punishment, but only as a last resort.

One philosophical assessment of corporal punishment includes a limited defense of it, which is open to revision or abandonment if future findings in psychology and child development warrant this (Benatar 1998). When such punishment is harsh or frequent, it is argued that this amounts to child abuse. However, when corporal punishment is understood as the infliction of physical pain without injury, then it may be permissible.

Several arguments in favor of banning such forms of punishment have been offered, but potential problems have been raised for them by Benatar. Some critics of corporal punishment argue that it leads to abuse. But it is argued by Benatar that the relevant evidence in support of this claim is not conclusive. And while some parents who engage in corporal punishment do abuse their children, it does not follow that corporal punishment is never permissible. If this were the case, then by parity of reasoning the abuse of alcohol or automobiles by some would justify banning their use in moderate and appropriate ways by all. The abusive use of corporal punishment is wrong, but this does not mean that non-abusive forms of such punishment are wrong. Others argue that corporal punishment degrades children, but there is no proof that it actually lowers their self-regard, or at least that it does so in an unacceptable manner. Others are concerned that corporal punishment produces psychological damage, such as anxiety, depression, or lowered self-esteem. There is evidence that excessive forms of such punishment have such effects, but not when it is mild and infrequent. Other critics argue that corporal punishment teaches the wrong lesson, namely, that our problems can be solved with the use of physical violence and that it fosters violent behavior in children who receive it. Yet the evidence does not show that the use of corporal punishment has this effect when it is mild and infrequent. Finally, critics argue that corporal punishment should not be used because it is ineffective in changing the behavior of children, though defenders of the practice dispute this claim as well (Cope 2010).

Whatever one concludes about the proper forms of punishment, corporal and non-corporal, one proposed function of whatever forms of punishment end up being morally permissible in the family is the promotion of trust in filial relationships (Hoekema 1999). Trust is important in the family, because it is essential for the flourishing of the parent-child relationship. Children must trust their parents, given facts about childhood development. And ideally, as their development warrants it, parents should trust their children. The justification of punishment, in this way of thinking, has to do with children failing to live up to the trust placed in them by their parents. As such, proper forms of punishment both reflect and reinforce that trust. If children destroy or damage property, fining them for doing so can restore trust, release them from the guilt resulting from their betrayal of trust, and then reestablish that trust which is conducive to their continued development and the quality of the parent-child relationship. A form of punishment that fails to foster trust, or that fosters fear, would be morally problematic.

e. The Religious Upbringing of Children

While it is commonplace for parents to seek to impart their own religious, moral, and political beliefs and practices to their children, some philosophers are critical of this and raise objections to this form of parental influence.

Some hold that parents should remain neutral with respect to the religion of their children, and not seek to influence the religious beliefs and practices of their offspring (Irvine 2001). One reason offered in support of this claim is that when parents rear their children within their preferred religious framework, insisting that they adopt their faith, such parents are being hypocritical. This is because, at some point in the past, the ancestors of those parents rejected the religion of their own parents. For example, if parents today insist their child adopt some Protestant form of Christianity, they are being hypocritical because at some point in the past their ancestors rejected Roman Catholicism, perhaps to the dismay of their parents, and this is said to constitute a form of hypocrisy. One reply to this has been that hypocrisy is not present, if the parents (and their ancestors) convert because they genuinely believe that the religion in question is true. If this is the justification, then no hypocrisy obtains (Austin 2009).

There are other problems with parents insisting that their children adopt their religious faith, however, having to do with autonomy. Parents may limit their children’s access to certain kinds of knowledge, such as knowledge concerning sexuality, because of their religious faith. In the name of religion, some parents also restrict access to certain forms of education which limits the autonomy of children by preventing them from coming to know about various conceptions of the good life. This may also limit their options and opportunities as adults, which limits the future autonomy of such children.

One important view concerning parenting and religious faith includes the claim that justice restricts the freedom of parents with respect to inculcating belief in a comprehensive doctrine, that is, in a broad view of the good life for human beings (Clayton 2006). This not only includes religious frameworks, but secular ones as well. The primary reason for this is that the autonomy of children must be safeguarded, as they have an interest in being raised in an environment which allows them to choose from a variety of options with respect to the good life, both religious and non-religious. The view here is that children may only be reared within a comprehensive doctrine, such as Christianity, Islam, or humanism, if they are able to and in fact do give autonomous consent, or have the intellectual capacities required to conceive of the good and of the good life. If neither of these requirements obtain, then it is wrong for parents to seek to impart their beliefs to their children. Once their children can conceive of the good and the good life, or are able to give consent to believe and practice the religion or other comprehensive doctrine, then parents may seek to do so. On this view, parents may still seek to encourage the development of particular virtues, such as generosity, in their children, as this does not threaten autonomy and helps children to develop a sense of justice. Parents are obligated to help them develop such a sense, and so this type of moral instruction and encouragement is not only permissible, but in fact obligatory for them. In reply, it has been argued that there are ways for parents to bring their children up within a particular religion or other comprehensive doctrine that protect their autonomy and help children gain a deep understanding of the nature and value of such a doctrine. Perhaps a middle ground between indoctrination and the foregoing restrictive approach is possible.

f. Parental Love

It is fitting to close with what is arguably the most important parental obligation, the obligation to love one’s children. Some philosophers—Kant, for example—believe that there is not and indeed cannot be an obligation to love another person, because love is an emotion and emotions are not under our control. Since we cannot be obligated to do something which we cannot will ourselves to do, there is no duty to love. However, some contemporary philosophers have challenged this conclusion and argued that parents do have a moral obligation to love their children (Austin 2007, Boylan 2011, Liao 2006). One reason for this is that parents have the obligation to attempt to develop the capacities in their children that are needed for a flourishing life. There is ample empirical evidence that a lack of love can harm a child’s psychological, cognitive, social, and physical development. Given this, parents are obligated to seek to foster the development of the capacities for engaging in close and loving personal relationships in their children. A primary way that parents can do this is by loving their children and seeking to form such a relationship with them. There are ways in which parents can successfully bring about the emotions associated with loving children. For example, a parent can give himself reasons for having loving emotions for his children. A parent can bring about circumstances and situations in which it is likely that she will feel such emotions. In these and many other ways, the dispositions to feel parental love can be strengthened. To say that all emotions, including the emotions associated with parental love, cannot be commanded by morality because they cannot be controlled by us is too strong a claim. Finally, there are also reasons for thinking that it is not merely the responsibility of parents to love their children, but that all owe a certain kind of love to children (Boylan 2011). If this is true, then much more needs to be done to not only encourage parents to love their children in ways that will help them to flourish, but to change social structures so that they are more effective at satisfying this central interest of children.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Almond, Brenda. The Fragmenting Family. New York: Oxford University Press, 2006.
    • Criticizes arguments for the claim that the family is merely a social construct.
  • Archard, David and David Benatar, eds. Procreation and Parenthood. New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
    • Several essays focus on the ethics of bringing a child into existence, while the others center on the grounds and form of parental rights and obligations, once a child exists.
  • Archard, David, and Colin Mcleod, eds. The Moral and Political Status of Children. New York: Oxford University Press, 2002.
  • Archard, David. Children: Rights and Childhood, 2nd edition. New York: Routledge, 2004.
    • Extensive discussion of the rights of children and their implications for parenthood and the state’s role in family life.
  • Austin, Michael W. Wise Stewards: Philosophical Foundations of Christian Parenting (Grand Rapids, MI: Kregel Academic, 2009)
    • A discussion of the parent-child relationship that combines theological and philosophical reflection in order to construct an everyday ethic of parenthood that is distinctly Christian.
  • Austin, Michael W. Conceptions of Parenthood: Ethics and the Family. Aldershot: Ashgate, 2007.
    • A comprehensive critical overview of the main philosophical accounts of the rights and obligations of parents (including an extensive defense of the causal view of parental obligations) and their practical implications.
  • Austin, Michael W. “The Failure of Biological Accounts of Parenthood.” The Journal of Value Inquiry 38 (2004): 499-510.
    • Rejects biological accounts of parental rights and obligations.
  • Bassham, Gregory, Marc Marchese, and Jack Ryan. “Work-Family Conflict: A Virtue Ethics Analysis.” Journal of Business Ethics 40 (2002): 145-154.
    • Discussion of balancing work and family responsibilities, from the perspective of virtue ethics.
  • Bayne, Tim. “Gamete Donation and Parental Responsibility.” Journal of Applied Philosophy 20 (2003): 77-87.
    • Criticizes arguments that gamete donors take their responsibilities to their offspring too lightly.
  • Benatar, David. “The Unbearable Lightness of Bringing into Being.” Journal of Applied Philosophy 16 (1999): 173-180.
    • Argues that gamete donation is almost always morally wrong.
  • Benatar, David. “Corporal Punishment.” Social Theory and Practice 24 (1998): 237-260.
    • Evaluates many of the standard arguments against corporal punishment.
  • Blustein, Jeffrey. Parents and Children: The Ethics of the Family. New York: Oxford University Press, 1982.
    • Includes a historical overview of what philosophers have had to say about the family, an account of familial obligations, and a discussion of public policy related to the family.
  • Bodin, Jean. Six Books of the Commonwealth. Translated by M. J. Tooley. New York: Barnes and Noble, 1967.
    • Contains Bodin’s statement of absolutism.
  • Boylan, Michael. “Duties to Children.” The Morality and Global Justice Reader. Michael Boylan, ed. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 2011, pp. 385-403.
    • Argues that all people, including but not limited to parents, have duties to children related to the basic goods of human agency.
  • Brennan, Samantha, and Robert Noggle, eds. Taking Responsibility for Children. Waterloo: Wilfrid Laurier University Press, 2007.
  • Brighouse, Harry and Adam Swift. “Parents’ Rights and the Value of the Family.” Ethics 117 (2006): 80-108.
    • An argument in favor of limited and conditional parental rights, based upon the interests of parents and children.
  • Clayton, Matthew. Justice and Legitimacy in Upbringing. New York: Oxford University Press, 2006.
    • Applies particular principles of justice to childrearing.
  • Cohen, Howard. Equal Rights for Children. Totowa, NJ: Littlefield, Adams, and Co., 1980.
    • Makes a case for the claim that children should have equal rights and discusses social policy implications of this view.
  • Cope, Kristin Collins. “The Age of Discipline: The Relevance of Age to the Reasonableness of Corporal Punishment.” Law and Contemporary Problems 73 (2010): 167-188.
    • Includes a discussion of the legal issues and debates surrounding corporal punishment, as well as references to recent research on both sides of this debate concerning its efficacy and propriety.
  • Donnelly, Michael, and Murray Straus, eds. Corporal Punishment of Children in Theoretical Perspective. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2005.
    • A collection of essays from a variety of disciplines which address a wide range of issues concerning corporal punishment.
  • Feinberg, Joel. “The Child’s Right to an Open Future.” In Whose Child?: Children’s Rights, Parental Authority, and State Power. Edited by William Aiken and Hugh LaFollette. Totowa, NJ: Littlefield, Adams, and Co., 1980, pp. 124-153.
    • Argues that the future autonomy of children limits parental authority in important ways.
  • Feldman, Susan. “Multiple Biological Mothers: The Case for Gestation.” Journal of Social Philosophy 23 (1992): 98-104.
    • Consequentialist argument for a social policy favoring gestational mothers when conflicts over custody arise.
  • Foreman, Edwin and Rosalind Ekman Ladd. “Making Decisions—Whose Choice?” Children’s Rights Re-Visioned. Rosalind Ekman Ladd, ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 1996, pp. 175-183.
    • A brief introduction to the core issues concerning medical decision making and the family.
  • Gaylin, Willard and Ruth Macklin, eds. Who Speaks for the Child: The Problems of Proxy Consent. New York: Plenum Press, 1982.
    • A collection of essays addressing medical decision making in the family.
  • Hall, Barbara. “The Origin of Parental Rights.” Public Affairs Quarterly 13 (1999): 73-82.
    • Explores the connections between the concept of self-ownership, biological parenthood, and parental rights.
  • Harris, John. “Liberating Children.” The Liberation Debate: Rights at Issue. Michael Leahy and Dan Cohn-Sherbok, eds. New York: Routledge, 1996, pp. 135-146.
    • Discusses and argues for children’s liberation, including discussion of the consistency problem.
  • Haslanger, Sally. “Family, Ancestry and Self: What is the Moral Significance of Biological Ties?” Adoption & Culture 2.
    • A criticism of David Velleman’s argument that knowing our biological parents is crucial for forging a meaningful life.
  • Hoekema, David. “Trust and Punishment in the Family.” Morals, Marriage, and Parenthood. Laurence Houlgate, ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 1999, pp. 256-260.
    • Argues that punishment in the family should both result from and maintain trust.
  • Irvine, William B. Doing Right by Children. St. Paul, MN: Paragon House, 2001.
    • Offers a stewardship account of parenthood, contrasted with ownership approaches.
  • Kass, Leon. “The Wisdom of Repugnance.” The New Republic 216 (1997): 17-26.
    • Argues that human cloning should be banned.
  • Kolers, Avery and Tim Bayne. “’Are You My Mommy? On the Genetic Basis of Parenthood.” Journal of Applied Philosophy 18 (2001): 273-285.
    • Argues that certain genetic accounts of parental rights are flawed, while one is more promising.
  • LaFollette, Hugh. “Licensing Parents.” Philosophy and Public Affairs 9 (1980): 182-197.
    • Argues in favor of the claim that the state should require licenses for parents.
  • Liao, S. Matthew. “The Right of Children to be Loved.” The Journal of Political Philosophy 14 (2006): 420-440.
    • Defends the claim that children have a right to be loved by parents because such love is an essential condition for having a good life.
  • McFall, Michael. Licensing Parents: Family, State, and Child Maltreatment. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2009.
    • Contains arguments related to political philosophy, the family, and parental licensing.
  • Mills, Claudia. “The Child’s Right to an Open Future?” Journal of Social Philosophy 34 (2003): 499-509.
    • Critically evaluates the claim that children have a right to an open future.
  • Millum, Joseph. “How Do We Acquire Parental Rights?” Social Theory and Practice 36 (2010): 112-132.
    • Argues for an investment theory of parental rights, grounded in the work individuals have done as parents of a particular child.
  • Millum, Joseph. “How Do We Acquire Parental Responsibilities?” Social Theory and Practice 34 (2008): 74-93.
    • Argues that parental obligations are grounded in certain acts, the meaning of which is determined by social convention.
  • Montague, Phillip. “The Myth of Parental Rights.” Social Theory and Practice 26 (2000): 47-68.
    • Rejects the existence of parental rights on the grounds that such rights lack essential components of moral rights
  • Narayan, Uma and Julia Bartkowiak, eds. Having and Raising Children. University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press, 1999.
    • A collection of essays focused on a variety of ethical, political, and social aspects of the family.
  • Narveson, Jan. The Libertarian Idea. Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1988.
    • Contains a statement of proprietarianism.
  • Nelson, James Lindemann. “Parental Obligations and the Ethics of Surrogacy: A Causal Perspective.” Public Affairs Quarterly 5 (1991): 49-61.
    • Argues that causing children to come into existence, rather than decisions concerning reproduction, is the primary source of parental obligations.
  • Page, Edgar. “Parental Rights.” Journal of Applied Philosophy 1 (1984): 187-203.
    • Argues that biology is the basis of parental rights; advocates a version of proprietarianism without absolutism.
  • Purdy, Laura. In Their Best Interests?: The Case against Equal Rights for Children. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1992.
    • Criticizes children’s liberationism and argues that granting children equal rights is in neither their interest nor society’s.
  • Richards, Norvin. The Ethics of Parenthood. New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
    • Contains a discussion of the significance of biological parenthood, the obligations of parents, and the nature of the relationship between adult children and their parents.
  • Rothman, Barabara Katz. Recreating Motherhood. New York: W.M. Norton and Company, 1989.
    • A feminist treatment of a wide range of issues concerning the family.
  • Scales, Stephen. “Intergenerational Justice and Care in Parenting,” Social Theory and Practice 4 (2002): 667-677.
    • Argues for a social contract view, in which the moral community has the power to determine whether a person is capable of fulfilling the parental role.
  • Schoeman, Ferdinand. “Rights of Children, Rights of Parents, and the Moral Basis of the Family.” Ethics 91 (1980): 6-19.
    • An argument for parental rights based on filial intimacy.
  • Tittle, Peg, ed. Should Parents be Licensed? Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 2004.
    • An anthology of essays addressing a wide range of issues as they relate to the parental licensing debate.
  • Turner, Susan. Something to Cry About: An Argument Against Corporal Punishment of Children in Canada. Waterloo: Wilfrid Laurier University Press, 2002.
  • Velleman, J. David. “Family History.” Philosophical Papers 34 (2005): 357-378.
    • Argues that biological family ties are crucial with respect to the quest for a meaningful life.
  • Vopat, Mark. “Justice, Religion and the Education of Children.” Public Affairs Quarterly 23 (2009): 223-226.
  • Vopat, Mark. “Parent Licensing and the Protection of Children.” Taking Responsibility for Children. Samantha Brennan and Robert Noggle, eds. Waterloo: Wilfrid Laurier University Press, 2007, pp. 73-96.
  • Vopat, Mark. “Contractarianism and Children.” Public Affairs Quarterly 17 (2003): 49-63.
    • Argues that parental obligations are grounded in a social contract between parents and the state.
  • Willems, Jan C.M., ed. Developmental and Autonomy Rights of Children. Antwerp: Intersentia, 2007.


Author Information

Michael W. Austin
Email: mike.austin@eku.edu
Eastern Kentucky University
U. S. A.

Distributive Justice

Theories of distributive justice seek to specify what is meant by a just distribution of goods among members of society. All liberal theories (in the sense specified below) may be seen as expressions of laissez-faire with compensations for factors that they consider to be morally arbitrary. More specifically, such theories may be interpreted as specifying that the outcome of individuals acting independently, without the intervention of any central authority, is just, provided that those who fare ill (for reasons that the theories deem to be arbitrary, for example, because they have fewer talents than others) receive compensation from those who fare well.

Liberal theories of justice consider the process, or outcome, of individuals’ free actions to be just except insofar as this depends on factors, in the form of personal characteristics, which are considered to be morally arbitrary. In the present context these factors may be individuals’ preferences, their abilities, and their holdings of land. Such theories may, then, be categorized according to which of these factors each theory deems to be morally arbitrary.

There is a certain tension between the libertarian and egalitarian theories of justice. Special attention below is given to the views of Dworkin, Rawls, Nozick, and Sen.

Table of Contents

  1. A Taxonomy
    1. A Simple World
    2. Liberalism
  2. Justice as Fairness
    1. Two Principles
    2. A Social Contract
    3. The Difference Principle
    4. Choice Behind the Veil
    5. Summary
  3. Equality of Resources
    1. Initial Resources
    2. Fortune
    3. Handicaps
    4. Talents
    5. Summary
  4. Entitlements
    1. The Basic Schema
    2. Patterns
    3. Justice in Acquisition
    4. Justice in Transfer
    5. Justice in Rectification
    6. Summary
  5. Common Ownership
    1. A Framework
    2. The Transfer of Property
    3. The Holding of Property
    4. The Social Fund
    5. Summary
  6. Conclusions
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. References
    2. Further Reading

1. A Taxonomy

a. A Simple World

We begin with a simple hypothetical world in which there are a number of individuals and three commodities: a natural resource, called land; a consumption good, called food; and individuals’ labour. There is a given amount of land, which is held by individuals, but no stock of food: food may be created from land and labour. An individual is characterized by his preferences between food and leisure (leisure being the obverse of labour); by his ability, or productivity in transforming land and labour into food; and by his holding of land.

Liberal theories of justice consider the process, or outcome, of individuals’ free actions to be just except insofar as this depends on factors, in the form of personal characteristics, which are considered to be morally arbitrary. In the present context these factors may be individuals’ preferences, their abilities, and their holdings of land. Such theories may, then, be categorized according to which of these factors each theory deems to be morally arbitrary.

Equality has various interpretations in this simple world: these correspond to the theories discussed below. Liberty has two aspects: self-ownership, that is, rights to one’s body, one’s labour, and the fruits thereof; and resource-ownership, that is, rights to own external resources and the produce of these. Theories that fail to maintain self-ownership may be divided into those that recognize personal responsibility in that the extent of the incursions that they make are independent of how people exercise these (for example, in being industrious or lazy), and those that do not.

In a liberal context there is (as is justified below) no basis for comparing one individual’s wellbeing with another’s, so that theories of justice which require such comparisons cannot be accommodated. Accordingly, the theories of utilitarianism, which defines a distribution to be just if it maximizes the sum of each individual’s wellbeing, and of equality of welfare, which defines a distribution to be just if each individual has the same level of wellbeing, are not considered.

Four theories of justice are discussed: Rawlsian egalitarianism, or justice as fairness; Dworkinian egalitarianism, or equality of resources; Steiner-Vallentyne libertarianism, or common ownership; and Nozickian libertarianism, or entitlements. The following specification of the theories sets out, for each theory: its definition of justice; the personal characteristics that it considers to be arbitrary and therefore makes adjustments for; the nature of the institution under which this may be achieved; the justification of any inequalities which it accepts; and the extent to which it is consistent with liberty.

Justice as fairness defines a distribution to be just if it maximizes the food that the individual with the least food receives (this is the “maximin” outcome in terms of food, which is the sole primary good). It adjusts for preferences, ability, and land holdings. It is achieved by taxes and subsidies on income (that is, on the consumption of food). Inequalities in income, subject to the maximin requirement, are accepted because of the benefit they bring to the individual with the least income; all inequalities in leisure are accepted. Rights to neither self-ownership nor resource-ownership are maintained, and responsibility is not recognized.

Equality of resources defines a distribution to be just if everyone has the same effective resources, that is, if for some given amount of work each person could obtain the same amount of food. It adjusts for ability and land holdings, but not for preferences. It is achieved by taxes and subsidies on income. Inequalities in both food and leisure are accepted because they arise solely from choices made by individuals who have the same options. Rights to neither self-ownership nor resource-ownership are maintained, but responsibility is recognized.

Common ownership theories define a distribution to be just if each person initially has the same amount of land and all transactions between individuals are voluntary. It adjusts for land holdings, but not for preferences or abilities. It is achieved by a reallocation of holdings of land. Inequalities in both food and leisure are accepted because these arise solely from people having different preferences or abilities. Rights to self-ownership are maintained but rights to resource-ownership are not.

An entitlements theory defines a distribution to be just if the distribution of land is historically justified, that is if it arose from the appropriation by individuals of previously unowned land and voluntary transfers between individuals, and all other transactions between individuals are voluntary. It makes no adjustments (other than corrections for any improper acquisitions or transfers) and thus requires no imposed institution to achieve it. All inequalities are accepted. Rights to both self-ownership and resource-ownership are maintained.

As is apparent, the first two theories emphasize outcomes while the second two emphasize institutions. These four theories form a hierarchy, or decreasing progression, in terms of the personal characteristics that they consider to be morally arbitrary, and thus for which adjustments are made. The first theory adjusts for preferences, ability, and land holdings; the second only for ability and land holdings; the third only for land holdings; and the fourth for none of these (other than the corrections noted above). The four theories form a corresponding hierarchy, or increasing progression, in terms of the liberties (self-ownership, with or without personal responsibility, and resource-ownership) that they maintain: the first maintains neither, and does not recognize responsibility; the second maintains neither, but does recognize responsibility; the third maintains self-ownership but not resource-ownership; and the fourth maintains both self-ownership and resource-ownership.

These corresponding hierarchies are illustrated schematically in the table below (from Allingham, 2014, 4).


Arbitrary factors

Liberties maintained


Preferences - Ability - Land



Ability - Land




Responsibility - Self-ownership



Responsibility - Self-ownership - Resource-ownership


The remainder of this survey develops these theories of justice. It demonstrates that they also form a third hierarchy in terms of equality (of outcome), with Rawls’s justice as fairness as the most egalitarian, followed by Dworkin’s equality of resources, then common ownership in the Steiner-Vallentyne vein, and finally Nozick’s entitlements theory as the least egalitarian. The order in which these theories are discussed differs from that of the decreasing progression in terms of what they consider to be arbitrary: specifically, the discussion of entitlements precedes that of common ownership. The reason for this is that common ownership theories follow temporally, and draw on, Nozick’s entitlements theory.

b. Liberalism 

The theories of justice considered are liberal in that they do not presuppose any particular conception of the good. They subscribe to what Sandel calls deontological liberalism: “society, being composed of a plurality of persons, each with his own aims, interests, and conceptions of the good, is best arranged when it is governed by principles that do not themselves presuppose any particular conception of the good” (1998, 1).

The importance of deontological liberalism is that it precludes any interpersonal comparisons of utility. As Scanlon (who supports interpersonal comparisons) accepts, “interpersonal comparisons present a problem insofar as it is assumed that the judgements of relative well-being on which social policy decisions, or claims of justice, are based should not reflect value judgements” (1991, 17). And Hammond, who also supports interpersonal comparisons, accepts that such comparisons “really do require that an individual’s utility be the ethical utility or worth of that individual to the society” (191, 237). If we are not prepared to take a position on someone’s worth to society then we cannot engage in interpersonal utility comparisons. It is in the light of this that Arrow notes that “it requires a definite value judgement not derivable from individual sensations to make the utilities of different individuals dimensionally compatible and a still further value judgement to aggregate them”, and accordingly concludes that “interpersonal comparison of utilities has no meaning and, in fact, … there is no meaning relevant to welfare comparisons in the measurability of individual utility” (2012, 9-11).

2. Justice as Fairness

Justice as fairness, as developed by Rawls, treats all personal attributes as being morally arbitrary, and thus defines justice as requiring equality, unless any departure from this benefits everyone. This view is summarized in Rawls’s “general conception of justice”, which is that “all social values - liberty and opportunity, income and wealth, and the social bases of self-respect - are to be distributed equally unless an unequal distribution of any, or all, of these values is to everyone’s advantage”: injustice “is simply inequalities that are not to the benefit of all” (1999, 24).

a. Two Principles

Rawls’s interpretation is made more precise in his two principles of justice. He proposes various formulations of these; the final formulation is that of Political Liberalism:

a. Each person has an equal claim to a fully adequate scheme of equal basic rights and liberties, which scheme is compatible with the same scheme for all; and in this scheme the equal political liberties, and only those liberties, are to be guaranteed their fair value.

b. Social and economic inequalities are to satisfy two conditions: first, they are to be attached to positions and offices open to all under conditions of fair equality of opportunity; and second, they are to be to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged members of society (2005, 5-6).

These principles are lexically ordered: the first principle has priority over the second; and in the second principle the first part has priority over the second part. For the specific question of distributive justice, as opposed to the wider question of political justice, it is the final stone in the edifice that is crucial: this is the famous difference principle.

b. A Social Contract

Rawls justifies his two principles of justice by a social contract argument. For Rawls, a just state of affairs is a state on which people would agree in an original state of nature. Rawls seeks “to generalize and carry to a higher order of abstraction the traditional theory of the social contract as represented by Locke, Rousseau, and Kant”, and to do so in a way “that it is no longer open to the more obvious objections often thought fatal to it” (1999, xviii).

Rawls sees the social contract as being neither historical nor hypothetical but a thought-experiment for exploring the implications of an assumption of moral equality as embodied in the original position. To give effect to this Rawls assumes that the parties to the contract are situated behind a veil of ignorance where they do not know anything about themselves or their situations, and accordingly are equal. The intention is that as the parties to the contract have no information about themselves they necessarily act impartially, and thus as justice as fairness requires. As no one knows his circumstances, no one can try to impose principles of justice that favour his particular condition.

c. The Difference Principle

Rawls argues that in the social contract formed behind a veil of ignorance the contractors will adopt his two principles of justice, and in particular the difference principle: that all inequalities “are to be to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged members of society”. This requires the identification of the least advantaged. There are thee aspects to this: what constitutes the members of society; what counts as being advantaged; and how the advantages of one member are to be compared with those of another.

It would seem natural in defining the least advantaged members of society to identify the least advantaged individuals, but Rawls does not do this. Instead, he seeks to identify representatives of the least advantaged group.

The wellbeing of representatives is assessed by their allocation of what Rawls terms primary goods. There are two classes of primary goods. The first class comprises social primary goods, such as liberty (the subject matter of the first part of the second principle of justice) and wealth (the subject matter of the second part of that principle). The second class comprises natural primary goods, such as personal characteristics. Justice as fairness is concerned with the distribution of social primary goods; and of these the difference principle is concerned with those that are the subject matter of the second part of the second principle of justice, such as wealth.

Rawls’s primary goods are “things which it is supposed a rational man wants whatever else he wants”: regardless of what precise things someone might want “it is assumed that there are various things which he would prefer more of rather than less”. More specifically, “primary social goods, to give them in broad categories, are rights, liberties, and opportunities, and income and wealth”. These fall into two classes: the first comprise rights, liberties, and opportunities; and the second, which is the concern of the difference principle, income and wealth. The essential difference between these classes is that “liberties and opportunities are defined by the rules of major institutions and the distribution of income and wealth is regulated by them” (1999, 79).

The construction of an index of primary social goods poses a problem, for income and wealth comprise a number of disparate things and these cannot immediately be aggregated into a composite index. Rawls proposes to construct such an index “by taking up the standpoint of the representative individual from this group and asking which combination of primary social goods it would be rational for him to prefer”, even though “in doing this we admittedly rely upon intuitive estimates” (1999, 80).

d. Choice Behind the Veil

Each contractor considers all feasible distributions of primary goods and chooses one. Because the contractors have been stripped of all distinguishing characteristics they all make the same choice, so there is in effect only one contractor. The distributions that this contractor considers allocate different amounts of primary goods to different positions, not to named persons.

The contractor does not know which position he will occupy, and as he is aware that he may occupy the least advantaged position he chooses the distribution that allocates the highest index of primary goods to that position. That is, he chooses the distribution that maximizes the index of the least advantaged, or minimum, position. Rawls thus considers his “two principles as the maximin solution to the problem of social justice” since “the maximin rule tells us to rank alternatives by their worst possible outcomes: we are to adopt the alternative the worst outcome of which is superior to the worst outcomes of the others” (1999, 132-133).

A major problem with Rawls’s theory of justice is that rational contractors will not, except in a most extreme case, choose the maximin outcome. Despite Rawls claiming that “extreme attitudes to risk are not postulated” (1999, 73) it appears that they are, and thus to choose the maximin distribution is to display the most extreme aversion to risk. In global terms, it is to prefer the distribution of world income in which 7 billion people have just $1 above a widely accepted subsistence income level of $365 a year to the distribution in which all of these except one (who has $365 a year) have the income of the average Luxembourger with $80,000 a year. It is to choose a world of universal abject poverty over one of comfortable affluence for all but one person. As Roemer expresses it, “the choice, by such a [representative] soul, of a Rawlsian tax scheme is hardly justified by rationality, for there seems no good reason to endow the soul with preferences that are, essentially, infinitely risk averse” (1996, 181).

Rawls appreciates that “there is a relation between the two principles and the maximin rule for choice under uncertainty”, and accepts that “clearly the maximin rule is not, in general, a suitable guide for choices under uncertainty”. However, he claims that it is a suitable guide if certain features obtain, and seeks to show that “the original position has these features to a very high degree”. He identifies three such features. The first is that “since the rule takes no account of the likelihoods of the possible circumstances, there must be some reason for sharply discounting estimates of these probabilities”. The second is that “the person choosing has a conception of the good such that he cares very little, if anything, for what he might gain above the minimum stipend that he can, in fact, be sure of by following the maximin rule”. The third is that “the rejected alternatives have outcomes that one can hardly accept” (1999, 132-134). However, none of these three features appears to justify the choice by a rational contractor of the maximin distribution. Accordingly, Roemer concludes that “the Rawlsian system is inconsistent and cannot be coherently reconstructed” (1996, 182).

e. Summary

The strength of Rawls’s theory of justice as fairness lies in its combination of the fundamental notion of equality with the requirement that everyone be better off than they would be under pure equality. However, the theory has a number of problems. Some of these may be avoided by inessential changes, but other problems are unavoidable, particularly that of identifying the least advantaged (with the related problems of defining primary goods and the construction of an index of these), and that of the supposedly rational choice of the maximin principle with, as Harsanyi puts it, its “absurd practical implications” (1977, 47 as reprinted).

3. Equality of Resources

Equality of resources, as developed by Dworkin, treats individuals’ abilities and external resources as arbitrary, but makes no adjustments for their preferences. The essence of this approach is the distinction between ambition-sensitivity, which recognizes differences which are due to differing ambitions, and endowment-sensitivity, which recognizes differences that are due to differing endowments.

a. Initial Resources

Dworkin accepts that inequalities are acceptable if they result from voluntary choices, but not if they result from disadvantages that have not been chosen. However, initial equality of resources is not sufficient for justice. Even if everyone starts from the same position one person may fare better than another because of her good luck, or, alternatively, because of her lesser handicaps or greater talents.

Dworkin motivates his theory of justice with the example of a number of survivors of a shipwreck who are washed up, with no belongings, on an uninhabited island with abundant natural resources. The survivors accept that these resources should be allocated among them in some equitable fashion, and agree that for a division to be equitable it must meet “the envy test”, which requires that no one “would prefer someone else’s bundle of resources to his own bundle” (1981, 285). The envy test, however, is too weak a test: Dworkin gives examples of allocations that meet this test but appear inequitable. Can you give an illustration here

To deal with such cases Dworkin proposes that the survivors appoint an auctioneer who gives each of them an equal number of tokens. The auctioneer divides the resources into a number of lots and proposes a system of prices, one for each lot, denominated in tokens. The survivors bid for the lots, with the requirement that their total proposed expenditure in tokens not exceed their endowment of tokens. If all markets clear, that is, if there is precisely one would-be purchaser for each lot, then the process ends. If all markets do not clear then the auctioneer adjusts the prices, and continues to adjust them until they do.

b. Fortune

Dworkin seeks to make people responsible for the effects of their choices, but not for matters beyond their control. To take account of the latter, he distinguishes between “option luck” and “brute luck”. Option luck is “a matter of how deliberate and calculated gambles turn out”. Brute luck is “a matter of how risks fall out that are not in that sense deliberate gambles” (1981, 293). People should be responsible for the outcomes of option luck, but not of brute luck.

Dworkin’s key argument concerning luck is that “insurance, so far as it is available, provides a link between brute and option luck, because the decision to buy or reject catastrophe insurance is a calculated gamble”. Then because people should be responsible for the outcomes of option luck they should be responsible for the outcomes of all luck, at least if they could have bought insurance. Accordingly, Dworkin amends his envy test by requiring that “any resources gained through a successful gamble should be represented by the opportunity to take the gamble at the odds in force, and comparable adjustments made to the resources of those who have lost through gambles” (1981, 293-295).

c. Handicaps

Insurance cannot remove all risks: if someone is born blind he cannot buy insurance against blindness. Dworkin seeks to take account of this through a hypothetical insurance scheme. He asks how much an average person would be prepared to pay for insurance against being handicapped if in the initial state everyone had the same, and known, chance of being handicapped. He then supposes that “the average person would have purchased insurance at that level” (1981, 298), and proposes to compensate those who do develop handicaps out of a fund that is collected by taxation but designed to match the fund that would have been provided through insurance premiums. The compensation that someone with a handicap is to receive is the contingent compensation that he would have purchased, knowing the risk of being handicapped, had actual insurance been available.

Accordingly, the auction procedure is amended so that the survivors “now establish a hypothetical insurance market which they effectuate through compulsory insurance at a fixed premium for everyone based on speculations about what the average immigrant… would have purchased by way of insurance had the antecedent risk of various handicaps been equal” (1981, 301).

This process establishes equality of effective resources at the outset, but this equality will typically be disturbed by subsequent economic activity. If some survivors choose to work more than others they will produce, and thus have, more than their more leisurely compatriots. Thus at some stage the envy test will not be met. This, however, does not create a problem because the envy test is to be applied diachronically: “it requires that no one envy the bundle of occupation and resources at the disposal of anyone else over time, though someone may envy another’s bundle at any particular time” (1981, 306). Since everyone had the opportunity to work hard it would violate rather than endorse equality of resources if the wealth of the hardworking were from time to time to be distributed to the more leisurely.

d. Talents

The essential reason why differential talents create a problem is that equality of resources at the outset will typically be disturbed, not because of morally acceptable differences in work habits, but because of morally arbitrary differences in talents.

Requiring equality of resources only at the outset would be what Dworkin calls a starting-gate theory of fairness, which Dworkin sees as being “very far from equality of resources” and strongly rejects: “indeed it is hardly a coherent political theory at all”. Such a theory holds that justice requires equality of initial resources, but accepts laissez-faire thereafter. The fundamental problem with a starting-gate theory is that it relies on some purely arbitrary starting point. If the requirement of equality of resources is to apply at one arbitrary point, then presumably it is to apply at other points. If justice requires a Dworkinian auction when the survivors arrive, then it must require such an auction from time to time thereafter; and if justice accepts laissez-faire thereafter, it must accept it when they arrive. Dworkin requires neither that there be periodic auctions nor that there be laissez-faire at all times. His theory does not suppose that an equal division of resources is appropriate at one point in time but not at any other; it argues only that the resources available to someone at any moment be a function of the resources available to or consumed by him at others.

Dworkin’s aim is to specify a scheme that allows the distribution of resources at any point of time to be both ambition-sensitive, in that it reflects the cost or benefit to others of the choices people make, but not be endowment-sensitive, in that it allows scope for differences in ability among people with the same ambitions. To achieve this, Dworkin proposes a hypothetical insurance scheme that is analogous to that for handicaps. In this scheme it is supposed that people know what talents they have, but not the income that these will produce, and choose a level of insurance accordingly. An imaginary agency knows each person’s talents and preferences, and also knows what resources are available and the technology for transforming these into other resources. On the basis of this it computes the income structure, that is, the number of people earning each level of income that will emerge in a competitive market. Each person may buy insurance from the agency to cover the possibility of his income falling below whatever level he cares to name. Dworkin asks “how much of such insurance would the survivors, on average, buy, at what specified level of income coverage, and at what cost?” (1981, 317) and claims that the agency can answer this question.

This, however, is not clear. Consider four very weak requirements of such a scheme: it should distribute resources in such a way that not everyone could be better off under any alternative scheme; an increase in the resources available for allocation should not make anyone worse off; if two people have the same preferences and abilities then they should be allocated the same resources; and the scheme should not damage those whom it seeks to help. As is shown by Roemer, there is in Dworkin’s framework no scheme that satisfies these requirements, so that “resource egalitarianism is an incoherent notion” (1985, 178).

e. Summary

The strength of Dworkin’s equality of resources theory of justice is that it seeks to introduce ambition-sensitivity without allowing endowment-sensitivity. To the extent to which it succeeds in this it thus, in Cohen’s words, incorporates within egalitarianism “the most powerful idea in the arsenal of the anti-egalitarian right: the idea of choice and responsibility” (1989, 933).

However, it is not entirely successful in this endeavour. There are a number of problems with Dworkin’s auction scheme: for example, it is not clear that the auctioneer will ever discover prices at which there is precisely one would-be purchaser for each lot. However, these may be avoided by adopting the intended outcome of the auction, that is, as a free-market outcome in which everyone has the same wealth, as a specification of justice in its own right. But the problems with the insurance scheme are deeper, as Roemer’s argument (presented above) demonstrates.

4. Entitlements

Nozick’s entitlements theory (as an extreme) treats no personal attributes as being arbitrary, and thus defines justice simply as laissez-faire, provided that no one’s rights are infringed. In this view “the complete principle of distributive justice would say simply that a distribution is just if everyone is entitled to the holdings they possess under the distribution” (1974, 151).

a. The Basic Schema

Nozick introduces his approach to “distributive justice” by noting that the term is not a neutral one, but presupposes some central authority that is effecting the distribution. But that is misleading, for there is no such body. Someone’s property holdings are not allocated to her by some central planner: they arise from the sweat of her brow or through voluntary exchanges with, or gifts from, others. There is “no more a distributing or distribution of shares than there is a distributing of mates in a society in which persons choose whom they shall marry” (1974, 150).

Accordingly, Nozick holds that the justice of a state of affairs is a matter of whether individuals are entitled to their holdings. In Nozick’s schema, individuals’ entitlements are determined by two principles, justice in acquisition and justice in transfer:

If the world were wholly just, the following inductive definition would exhaustively cover the subject of justice in holdings.

1. A person who acquires a holding in accordance with the principle of justice in acquisition is entitled to that holding.

2. A person who acquires a holding in accordance with the principle of justice in transfer, from someone else entitled to the holding, is entitled to the holding.

3. No one is entitled to a holding except by (repeated) applications of 1 and 2. (1974, 151)

However, the world may not be wholly just: as Nozick observes, “not all actual situations are generated in accordance with the two principles of justice in holdings”. The existence of past injustice “raises the third major topic under justice in holdings: the rectification of injustice in holdings” (1974, 152).

b. Patterns

Nozick distinguishes entitlement principles of justice from patterned principles. A principle is patterned if “it specifies that a distribution is to vary along with some natural dimension, weighted sum of natural dimensions, or lexicographic ordering of natural dimensions”. A distribution that is determined by peoples’ ages or skin colours, or by their needs or merits, or by any combination of these, is patterned. Nozick claims that “almost every suggested principle of distributive justice is patterned” (1974, 156), where by “almost” he means “other than entitlement principles”.

The fundamental problem with patterned principles is that liberty upsets patterns. As Hume expresses it, “render possessions ever so equal, men’s different degrees of art, care, and industry will immediately break that equality” (1751, 3.2). Nozick argues this using his famous Wilt Chamberlain example.

Suppose that a distribution that is (uniquely) specified as just by some patterned principle of distributive justice is realized: this may be one in which everyone has an equal share of wealth, or where shares vary in any other patterned way. Now there is a basketball player, one Wilt Chamberlain, who is of average wealth but of superior ability. He enters into a contract with his employers under which he will receive 25 cents for each admission ticket sold to see him play. As he is so able a player a million people come to watch him. Accordingly, Mr Chamberlain earns a further $250,000. The question is, is this new distribution, in which Mr Chamberlain is much better off than in the original distribution, and also much better off than the average person, just? One answer must be that it is not, for the new distribution differs from the old, and by hypothesis the old distribution (and only that distribution) was just. On the other hand, the original distribution was just, and people moved from that to the new distribution entirely voluntarily. Mr Chamberlain and his employers voluntarily entered into the contract; all those who chose to buy a ticket to watch Mr Chamberlain play did so voluntarily; and no one else was affected. All holdings under the original distribution were, by hypothesis, just, and people have used them to their advantage: if people were not entitled to use their holdings to their advantage (subject to not harming others) it is not clear why the original distribution would have allocated them any holdings. If the original distribution was just and people voluntarily moved from it to the new distribution then the new distribution must be just.

c. Justice in Acquisition

Acquisition of material is considered to be just if what is acquired is freely available and if acquiring it leaves sufficient material for others. Giving an operational meaning to this requires the specification of what acquisition means, what is freely available, and how leaving sufficient material for others is to be interpreted. In these, Nozick, albeit with reservations, follows Locke.

Locke interprets “acquiring” as “mixing one’s labour with” (1689, 2.5.27). I own my labour, and if I inextricably mix my labour with something that no one else owns then I make that thing my own. However, as Nozick points out (without proposing any resolution of these) there are a number of problems with this interpretation. It is not clear why mixing something that I own with something that I do not own implies that I gain the latter rather than lose the former. In Nozick’s example, “if I own a can of tomato juice and spill it in the sea … do I thereby come to own the sea, or have I foolishly dissipated my tomato juice?” Further, it is not clear what determines how much of the unowned resource I come to own. If I build a fence around a previously unowned plot of land do I own all that I have enclosed, or simply the land under the fence? In Nozick’s example, “if a private astronaut clears a place on Mars, has he mixed his labor with (so that he comes to own) the whole planet, the whole uninhabited universe, or just a particular plot?” (1974, 174-175).

Locke interprets “freely available” as being “in the state that nature hath provided”, and Nozick (without any argument) follows Locke in equating “freely available” with “unowned”. There are however, other possibilities. Virgin resources may be seen as being owned in common, or as being jointly owned in equal shares.

Locke interprets leaving sufficient for others as there being “enough, and as good, left in common for others” (1689, 2.5.27); this is the famous Lockean proviso. There are two possible interpretations of this: I may be made worse off by your appropriating a particular plot of land by no longer being able to appropriate it myself, or by no longer being able to use it. Nozick adopts the second, weaker, version.

d. Justice in Transfer

The essence of Nozick’s principle of justice in transfer is that a transfer is just if it is voluntary, in that each party consents to it. Justice in transfer also involves the satisfaction of the Lockean proviso. This is both indirect and direct. It is indirect in that I cannot legitimately transfer to you something that has been acquired, by me or by anyone else, in violation of the proviso, for that thing is not rightfully mine to transfer. But the proviso is also direct, in that I may not by a series of transfers, each of which is legitimate on its own, acquire property that does not leave enough, and as good, for others.

e. Justice in Rectification

Nozick’s basic schema applies to a world that is “wholly just”. However, the world may not be wholly just: people may have violated the principle of justice in acquisition, for example, by appropriating so much of a thing that an insufficient amount is left for others; or they may have violated the principle of justice in transfer, for example, by theft or fraud. Then, as Nozick observes, “the existence of past injustice (previous violations of the first two principles of justice in holdings) raises the third major topic under justice in holdings: the rectification of injustice in holdings”. Nozick identifies a number of questions that this raises: if past injustice has shaped present holdings in ways that are not identifiable, what should be done; how should violators compensate the victims; how does the position change if compensation is delayed; how, if at all, does the position change if the violators or the victims are no longer living; is an injustice done to someone whose holding which was itself based upon an injustice is appropriated; do acts of injustice lose their force over time; and what may the victims of injustice themselves do to rectify matters? However, these questions are not answered: as Nozick admits, “I do not know of a thorough or theoretically sophisticated treatment of such issues” (1974, 152).

f. Summary

The strength of Nozick’s entitlements theory of justice is that it uncompromisingly respects individual liberty, and thus avoids all the problems associated with patterned approaches to justice. However, by avoiding patterns it introduces its own problems, for in asking how distributions came about, rather than in simply assessing them as they are, Nozick necessarily delves into the mists of time. Here lie the two most significant, and related, problems with Nozick’s theory: that of the relatively unsatisfactory nature of the principle of justice in initial acquisition, and that of the predominantly unexplained means of rectifying any injustice resulting from that.

5. Common Ownership

Common ownership theories in the Steiner-Vallentyne vein treat individuals’ holdings of external resources as arbitrary, but (at least directly) make no adjustments for their preferences or abilities. Such theories are diverse, but they all have in common the basic premise that individuals are full owners of themselves but external resources are owned by society in common. The theories differ in what they consider to be external resources, and in what is entailed by ownership in common.

a. A Framework

Common ownership theories, as entitlement theories, emphasize institutions, or processes, rather than outcomes. In essence, they consider an institution to be just if, firstly, it recognizes the principle of self-ownership and a further principle of liberty which may be called free association, and secondly, it involves some scheme of intervention on the holding or transmission of external resources that results, if not in common ownership itself, in a distribution of resources that shares some of the aspects of common ownership.

The principle of self-ownership, as Cohen’s expresses it, is that “each person enjoys, over herself and her powers, full and exclusive rights of control and use, and therefore owes no service or product to anyone else that she has not contracted to supply” (1995, 12). I have full ownership of myself if I have all the legal rights that someone has over a slave. Since a slaveholder has the legal rights to the labour of his slave and the fruits of that labour, each person is the morally rightful owner of his labour and of the fruits thereof.

The motivation for introducing a principle of free association is that what is legitimate for you and for me should be legitimate for us, subject to the satisfaction of the Lockean proviso (if relevant). Allingham proposes the principle that “each person has a moral right to combine any property to which he is entitled with the (entitled) property of other consenting persons (and share in the benefits from such combination in any manner to which each person agrees) provided that this does not affect any third parties” (2014, 110).

Schemes of intervention on the holding or transmission of property may take the form of absolute restrictions or of taxes on the holding or transfer of property.

b. The Transfer of Property

It might be thought that my rights to my property are empty if they do not permit me to do what I will with it (provided that this does not affect others), and in particular to give it to you. On the other hand, the passing down of wealth through the generations is one of the less intuitively appealing implications of this right. There are three ways of reconciling these two positions: restrictions or taxes on all gifts, on bequests, and on re-gifting.

The first proposal is based on Vallentyne’s claim that the right to transfer property to others does not guarantee that others have an unencumbered right to receive that property, and that, accordingly, the receipt of gifts may legitimately be subject to taxation. This would be to say that (the donor) having control rights in the property, and in particular the right to give it to someone, does not imply (the donee) having income rights in the property, and in particular the unencumbered right to enjoy it.

The motivation underlying the second proposal is, in Steiner’s words, “that an individual’s deserts should be determined by reference to his ancestor’s delinquencies is a proposition which doubtless enjoys a degree of biblical authority, but its grounding in any entitlement conception of justice seems less obvious” (1977, 152). Steiner’s argument in support of this position is that, contrary to Nozick’s view, bequests are fundamentally different to gifts inter vivos. Put simply, dead people do not exist, so cannot make gifts. Accordingly, the recipients of all bequests are to be taxed.

A third proposal is that people have rights to make and receive gifts, but not that these rights last for ever. More precisely, Allingham proposes that a scheme that “adopts the position that each person has a moral right to make any gifts (inter vivos or by bequest) to any other person (which person has a moral right to receive such gifts), but that any gifts that are deemed to be re-gifted may be subject to taxation” (2014, 120). If the gifts a person makes are less than those he receives then the former are deemed to be re-gifted; if the gifts he makes are greater than those he receives then the latter are deemed to be re-gifted. Thus I may freely give to you anything that I have created or earned but not consumed, but if I pass on anything that I myself have been given then this may be taxed.

c. The Holding of Property

Interventions on the holding of property may be seen as falling into three classes. One seeks to impose taxes on land by virtue of the fact that it is God-given, one on all natural resources by virtue of the fact that they are natural, and one on all property by virtue of the fact that it is property.

The claim that land, by natural right, belongs to all, like the claim that a person belongs to himself, is made by Locke: “God … hath given the world to men in common” (1689, 2.5.26). The claim is developed by a number of the nineteenth-century writers, and is most notably associated with George. As any improvements are not due to God it is only unimproved land, not developed land, which is relevant. In a typical contribution scheme proposed by Steiner, each “owner owes to the global fund a sum equal to the site’s rental value, that is, equal to the rental value of the site alone, exclusive of the value of any alterations in it wrought by labour” (1994, 272-273).

Land is not the only natural resource: what other property is to count is not clear. As Steiner notes, in any intervention scheme involving natural resources everything “turns on the isolation of what counts as ‘natural’” (1994, 277). There are many candidates. These, as summarized by Fried, include “gifts and bequests from the preceding generation; all traditional public goods (laws, police force, public works); the community’s physical productive capacity; and well-functioning markets” (2004, 85-86). Under these schemes all natural resources would be taxed in the same way as is land.

There are three possible justifications for taxing property per se: extending the concept of bequests; removing one of the incidents of ownership; and requiring a fee for protection. The first is based on a deemed lack of personal continuity over time: that “I tomorrow” am not the same person as “I today”. If this position is adopted then “I am holding property overnight” really means “I today” am bequeathing property to “I tomorrow”; the property is a bequest not a gift inter vivos as “I today” cease to exist at midnight. The second involves limiting the rights of ownership in external objects, that is, acknowledging only less than full ownership, specifically by excluding the incident of the absence of term, that one’s rights to property do not expire. If the incident of the absence of term is excluded then I have no unencumbered right to continue my ownership in some property from today until tomorrow. If I do so, the state may legitimately require that I pay for that privilege. The third justification distinguishes between the rights to enjoy and to hold through time. The former does not involve the state in any way, other than in non-interference, but the latter may, through the need for protection. If the state is to provide this protection it may legitimately charge a fee for this, and this fee may take the form of a tax on the holding of property.

d. The Social Fund

As common ownership theories typically involve the imposition of taxes, they need to determine how the social fund created by these taxes is to be applied. One natural way to do this is to specify that the social fund be distributed to everyone in equal shares. As an alternative, Nozick, with respect to the case where the social fund is collected explicitly to rectify historical injustices, suggests that the fund be distributed in such a way that the end result is close to Rawls’s difference principle.

A radically different way of dividing the social fund would be to use it to compensate those with unchosen disadvantages, as would be justified, for example, by the argument that such disadvantages were morally arbitrary. There is, however, something perverse about any proposal to apply the social fund in a way that compensates for unchosen personal endowments when all means of collecting the taxes that form that fund have, because of an adherence to the self-ownership principle, ruled out taxing people on that basis. As Fried expresses it, “schemes, which judge the tax and transfer sides of fiscal policy by wholly different distributive criteria, seem morally incoherent” (2004, 90).

e. Summary

The strength of common ownership theories is that, as Fried puts it, they “have staked out a middle ground between the two dominant strains of contemporary political philosophy: the conventional libertarianism of those such as Robert Nozick on the right, and the egalitarianism of those such as Rawls, Dworkin, and Sen on the left” (2004, 67). However, the open question remains as to whether such theories are, in Fried’s terms, “just liberal egalitarianism in drag” (2004, 84).

6. Conclusions

As regards internal consistency, Dworkin’s equality of resources theory may have the greatest problems. Some of the problems with Dworkin’s auction construction may be avoided by adopting its outcome, of an equal wealth equilibrium, as a specification of justice in its own right. The insurance scheme, however, has more serious and unavoidable problems. The fundamental flaw is that shown by Roemer: that no Dworkinian scheme can satisfy four very weak consistency conditions, so that “resource egalitarianism is an incoherent notion”.

Rawlsian justice as fairness fares a little better, but, if it is to be grounded in choice from behind a veil of ignorance, has the serious flaws of that construction. Some of these can be avoided by inessential changes, but other problems are unavoidable, particularly those of identifying the least advantaged (with the related problems of defining primary goods and the construction of an index of these), and of the supposedly rational choice of the maximin principle with its “absurd practical implications”.

Common ownership theories, being diverse, are harder to assess as a group. Theories that involve interventions of the transfer of property have a variety of arbitrariness problems, and typically violate some aspect of the principle of free association. Those that involve interventions on the holding of property have, on the whole, some serious arbitrariness problems, particularly as regards the definition of property.

Nozickian entitlements theory may have the fewest problems of consistency. But although they may be few they are not trivial, particularly those relating to justice in initial acquisition, and to the rectification of past injustice.

It is not clear that it is useful, let alone possible, to identify some most satisfactory theory of justice, and thus identify some most appropriate point in the liberty-equality spectrum. Since self-ownership is a cornerstone of liberty, the problem is given specific focus in Cohen’s claim that “anyone who supports equality of condition must oppose (full) self-ownership, even in a world in which rights over external resources have been equalized” (1995, 72).

In an absolute sense, it seems hard to disagree with Cohen. There may, however, be some room for compromise. From one end of the spectrum, equality of resources moves in that direction, particularly in making Rawlsian egalitarianism more ambition-sensitive without at the same time making it more endowment-sensitive. From the other end, some versions of common ownership also move in that direction. This is particularly the case for versions that embody rectification of past injustice: as Nozick accepts, “although to introduce socialism as the punishment for our sins would be to go too far, past injustices might be so great as to make necessary in the short run a more extensive state in order to rectify them” (1974, 231).

If an accommodation is to be found, it will be found towards the centre of the liberty-equality spectrum, that is, in equality of resources or in common ownership theories. Given the greater internal problems of the former, the latter may prove to be the more fruitful. However, common ownership theories are diverse, so this does not provide a complete prescription. But as Nozick reminds us, “there is room for words on subjects other than last words” (1974, xii).

7. References and Further Reading

a. References

  • Allingham, M. (2014) Distributive Justice, London, Routledge.
  • Arrow, K. J. (2012) Social Choice and Individual Values (third edition), New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Cohen, G. A. (1989) “On the currency of egalitarian justice”, Ethics, 99: 906-944.
  • Cohen, G. A. (1995) Self-Ownership, Freedom, and Equality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dworkin, R. (1981) “What is equality? Part 2: equality of resources”, Philosophy & Public Affairs 10: 283-345.
  • Fried, B. (2004) “Left-libertarianism: a review essay”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 32: 66–92.
  • Hammond, P. J. (1991) “Interpersonal comparisons of utility: why and how they are and should be made”, in Interpersonal Comparisons of Well-Being (editors J. Elster and J. E. Roemer) Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 200-254.
  • Harsanyi, J. (1977) “Morality and the theory of rational behavior”, Social Research, 44; reprinted in Utilitarianism and Beyond (editors A. Sen and B. Williams) Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 39-62.
  • Hume, D. (1751/1998) An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by T. L. Beauchamp, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Locke, J. (1689/1988) Two Treatises of Government, edited by P. Laslett, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nozick, R. (1974) Anarchy, State, and Utopia, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Rawls, J. (1999) A Theory of Justice (revised edition), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rawls, J. (2005) Political Liberalism (expanded edition), New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Roemer, J. E. (1985) “Equality of talent”, Economics and Philosophy, 1: 151-187.
  • Roemer, J. E. (1996) Theories of Distributive Justice, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Sandel, M. J. (2009) Justice: What’s the Right Thing to Do?, Allen Lane: London.
  • Scanlon, T. (1991) “The moral basis of interpersonal comparisons”, in Interpersonal Comparisons of Well-Being (editors J. Elster and J. E. Roemer) Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 17-44.
  • Steiner, H. (1977) “Justice and entitlement”, Ethics, 87: 150-152
  • Steiner, H. (1994) An Essay on Rights, Cambridge, MA: Blackwell.

b. Further Reading

  • Overviews
  • Vallentyne, P. (2007) “Distributive justice”, in A Companion to Contemporary Political Philosophy (editors R. Goodin, P. Pettit, and T. Pogge), Oxford: Blackwell, 548-562.
  • Wellman, C. H. (2002) “Justice”, in The Blackwell Guide to Social and Political Philosophy (edited by R. L. Simon), Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Justice as fairness
  • Freeman, S. (editor) (2003) The Cambridge Companion to Rawls, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Equality of resources
  • Brown, A. (2009) Ronald Dworkin’s Theory of Equality, London: Macmillan.
  • Entitlements
  • Bader R. M. and Meadowcroft J. (editors) (2011) The Cambridge Companion to Nozick's Anarchy, State, and Utopia, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Common ownership
  • Vallentyne, P. and Steiner, H. (editors) (2000) Left Libertarianism and Its Critics: The Contemporary Debate, Basingstoke: Palgrave.


Author Information

Michael Allingham
Email: michael.allingham@magd.ox.ac.uk
Oxford University
United Kingdom