Latin American Philosophy
This article outlines the history of Latin American philosophy: the thinking of its indigenous peoples, the debates over conquest and colonization, the arguments for national independence in the eighteenth century, the challenges of nation-building and modernization in the nineteenth century, the concerns over various forms of development in the twentieth century, and the diverse interests in Latin American philosophy during the opening decades of the twenty-first century. Rather than attempt to provide an exhaustive and impossibly long list of scholars’ names and dates, this article outlines the history of Latin American philosophy while trying to provide a meaningful sense of detail by focusing briefly on individual thinkers whose work points to broader philosophical trends that are inevitably more complex and diverse than any encyclopedic treatment can hope to capture.
The term “Latin American philosophy” refers broadly to philosophy in, from, or about Latin America. However, the definitions of both “Latin America” and “philosophy” are historically fluid and contested, leading to even more disagreement when combined. “Latin America” typically refers to the geographic areas on the American continent where languages derived from Latin are widely spoken: Portuguese in Brazil, and Spanish in most of Central America, South America, and parts of the Caribbean. The French-speaking parts of the Caribbean are sometimes included as well, but all mainland North American regions north of the Rio Grande are excluded in spite of French being widely spoken in Canada. Although it is anachronistic to speak of Latin American philosophy before the 1850s when the term “Latin America” first entered usage, most scholars agree that Latin American philosophy extends at least as far back as the sixteenth century when the Spanish founded the first schools and seminaries in the “New World”. Given this widespread agreement that there was “Latin American philosophy” before anyone was using the term “Latin America,” many scholars have argued for including pre-Columbian and pre-Cabralian thought in the history of Latin American philosophy. A number of indigenous cultures (particularly the Aztecs, Mayas, Incas, and Tupi-Guarani) produced sophisticated systems of thought long before Europeans arrived with their own understanding of “philosophy.”
The scholarly debate over whether or not to include indigenous thought in the history of Latin American philosophy reveals that the question of what constitutes Latin American philosophy hinges upon both our understanding of what constitutes Latin America and our understanding of what constitutes philosophy. It is worthwhile to remember that these and other labels are the products of human activity and dispute, not the result of a pre-ordained teleological process. Just as “America” was not called “America” by its indigenous inhabitants, the term “Latin America” emerged in the nineteenth century from outside of the region in French intellectual circles. The term competed against terms like “Ibero-America” until “Latin America” gained widespread and largely unquestioned usage in public and academic discourse in the second half of the twentieth century. More than a debate over mere terms, Latin American philosophy demonstrates a longstanding preoccupation with the identity of Latin America itself and a lively debate over the authenticity of its philosophy. Given the history of colonialism in the region, much of the history of Latin American philosophy analyzes ethical and sociopolitical issues, frequently treating concrete problems of practical concern like education or political revolution.
Table of Contents
- Indigenous Period
- Colonial Period
- Nineteenth Century
- Twentieth Century
- Generation of 1900: Foundational Critique of Positivism
- Generation of 1915: New Philosophical Directions
- Generation of 1930: Forging Latin American Philosophy
- Generation of 1940: Normalization of Latin American Philosophy
- Generation of 1960: Philosophies of Liberation
- Generation of 1980: Globalization, Postmodernism, and Postcolonialism
- Twenty-First Century
- References and Further Reading
Most histories of Western philosophy claim that philosophy began in ancient Greece with Thales of Miletus (c.624–c.546 B.C.E.) and other pre-Socratics who engaged in sophisticated speculation about the origins of the universe and its workings. There is ample evidence that a number of indigenous peoples in present-day Latin America also engaged in this sort of sophisticated speculation well before the 1500s when Europeans arrived to ask the question of whether it was philosophy. Moreover, a few Europeans during the early colonial period, including the Franciscan priest Bernardino de Sahagún (1499-1590), reported the existence of philosophy and philosophers among the indigenous Aztecs of colonial New Spain. In any case, whether or not most sixteenth-century European explorers, conquistadores, and missionaries believed that there were indigenous philosophies and philosophers, indigenous cultures produced sophisticated systems of thought centuries before Europeans arrived.
The largest and most notable of these indigenous civilizations are: the Aztec (in present-day central Mexico), the Maya (in present-day southern Mexico and northern Central America), and the Inca (in present-day western South America centered in Peru). Considerable challenges face scholars attempting to understand their complex systems of thought, since almost all of their texts and the other artifacts that would have testified most clearly concerning their intellectual production were systematically burned or otherwise destroyed by European missionaries who considered them idolatrous. Nevertheless, scholars have used the handful of pre-colonial codices and other available sources to reconstruct plausible interpretations of these philosophies, while remaining cognizant of the dangers inherent in using Western philosophical concepts to understand non-Western thought. See the article on Aztec Philosophy for an excellent example.
Academic philosophy during the colonial period was dominated by scholasticism imported from the Iberian Peninsula. With the support of Charles V—the first king of Spain and Holy Roman Emperor from 1516 to 1556—schools, monasteries, convents, and seminaries were established across the Indies (as the American continent and Caribbean were known then). Mexico was the main philosophical center in the early colonial period, with Peru gaining importance in the seventeenth century. The adherents of various religious orders who taught at these centers of higher learning emphasized the texts of medieval scholastics like Thomas Aquinas and Duns Scotus, as well as their Iberian commentators, particularly those associated with the School of Salamanca, for example, Francisco de Vitoria (c.1483-1546), Domingo de Soto (1494-1560), and Francisco Suárez (1548-1617). The thoroughly medieval style and sources of their theological and philosophical disputations concerning the Indies and its peoples contrast starkly with the extraordinarily new epistemological, ethical, religious, legal, and political questions that arose over time alongside attempts to colonize and missionize the New World. Much of the philosophy developed in the Indies appeared in isolation from its social and political context. For example, there was nothing uniquely Mexican about Antonio Rubio’s (1548-1615) Logica mexicana (1605). This careful analysis of Aristotelian logic in light of recent scholastic developments brought fame to the University of Mexico when it was adopted as logic textbook back in Europe where it went through seven editions.
One of the most famous philosophical debates of the early colonial period concerned the supposed rights of the Spanish monarchy over the indigenous peoples of the Indies. Bartolomé de las Casas (1484-1566) debated Ginés de Sepúlveda (1490-1573) at the Council of Valladolid (1550-1551). Sepúlveda, who had never traveled to America, defended the Spanish conquest as an instance of just war, outlined the rights of the colonizers to seize native lands and possessions, and claimed that it was morally just to enslave the Indians, arguing on the basis of Thomism, Scripture, and Aristotelian philosophy. Las Casas countered Sepúlveda’s arguments by drawing upon the same theological and philosophical sources as well as decades of his own experiences living in different parts of the Indies. Las Casas argued that the war against the Indians was unjust, that neither Spain nor the Church had jurisdiction over Indians who had not accepted Christ, and that Aristotle’s category of “natural slaves” did not apply to the Indians. No formal winner of the debate was declared, but it did lead to las Casas’ most influential work, In Defense of the Indians, written from 1548-1550.
Indigenous perspectives on some of these philosophical issues emerge in post-conquest texts that also depict pre-colonial life and history in light of more recent colonial violence. The work of Felipe Guamán Poma de Ayala (c.1550-1616), a native Andean intellectual and artist, serves as an excellent example. Written around 1615 and addressed to King Philip III of Spain, Guamán Poma’s The First New Chronicle and Good Government consists of nearly 800 pages of text in Spanish accompanied by many Quechua phrases and nearly 400 line drawings. Guamán Poma skillfully combines local histories, Spanish chronicles of conquest, Catholic moral and philosophical discourses (including those of Bartolomé de las Casas), various eyewitness accounts (including his own), and oral reports in multiple indigenous languages, to build a powerful case for maximum Indian autonomy given the ongoing history of abuse by Spanish conquerors, priests, and government officials. This and other post-conquest native texts affirm the ongoing existence of native intellectual traditions, contest the colonial European understanding of indigenous peoples as barbarians, and challenge Eurocentric views of American geography and history.
As part of European conquest and colonization a new social hierarchy or caste system based on race was developed. White Spanish colonists born on the Iberian Peninsula (peninsulares) held the highest position, followed by white Spaniards born in the Indies (criollos), both of whom were far above Indians (indios) and Africans (negros) in the hierarchy. First generation individuals born to parents of different races were called mestizos (Indian and white), mulatos (African and white), and sambos (Indian and African). The subsequent mixing of already mixed generations further complicated the hierarchy and led to a remarkably complex racial terminology. In any case, higher education was almost always restricted to whites, who typically had to demonstrate the purity of their racial origins in order to enroll. By the seventeenth century, well-educated criollos were developing new perspectives on the Indies and their colonial experience. Anxious to maintain their status through intellectual ties to the Iberian Peninsula while nevertheless establishing their own place and tradition in America, these thinkers reflected on diverse topics while developing a proto-nationalist discourse that would eventually lead to independence. The work of Carlos de Sigüenza y Góngora (1645-1700) provides an interesting case of criollo ambivalence with respect to American identity. On the one hand, Sigüenza idealized Aztec society and was one of the first criollos to appropriate their past in order to articulate the uniqueness of American identity. On the other hand, this did not prevent Sigüenza from despising contemporary Indians, especially when they rioted in the streets during a food shortage in Mexico City.
Similar to the way in which scholars have retrospectively perceived a budding nationalism in intellectuals like Sigüenza, Sor Juana Inés de la Cruz (1651-1695) is widely regarded as a forerunner of feminist philosophy in Latin America. Just as non-whites were typically barred from higher education based on European assumptions of racial inferiority, women were not permitted access to formal education on the assumption of sexual inferiority. Basic education was provided in female convents, but their reading and writing still occurred under the supervision of male church officials and confessors. After establishing a positive reputation for knowledge across literature, history, music, languages, and natural science, Sor Juana was publicly reprimanded for entering the male-dominated world of theological debate. Under the penname of Sor Philothea de la Cruz (Sister Godlover of the Cross), the Bishop of Puebla told Sor Juana to abandon intellectual pursuits that were improper for a woman. Sor Juana’s extensive answer to Sor Philothea subtly but masterfully defends rational equality between men and women, makes a powerful case for women’s right to education, and develops an understanding of wisdom as a form of self-realization.
Although leading Latin American intellectuals in the eighteenth century did not completely abandon scholasticism, they began to draw upon new sources in order to think through new social and political questions. Interest grew in early modern European philosophy and the Enlightenment, especially as this “new philosophy” entered the curriculum of schools and universities. The experimental and scientific methods gained ground over the syllogism, just as appeals to scriptural or Church authority were slowly replaced by appeals to experience and reason. The rational liberation from intellectual authority that characterized the Enlightenment also fueled desires for individual liberty and national autonomy, which became defining issues in the century that followed.
In the early nineteenth century, national independence movements swept through Latin America. However, some scholars have categorized these wars for independence as civil wars, since the majority of combatants on both sides were Latin Americans. Criollos, although a numerical minority (roughly 15% of the Latin American population in the early nineteenth century), led the push for political independence and clearly gained the most from it. In contrast, most of the combatants were mestizos (roughly 25% of the population) and indios (roughly 45% of the population) whose positions in society after national independence were scarcely improved and sometimes even made worse.
Scholars disagree about whether to understand changes in Latin American thought as causes or as effects of these political independence movements. In any case, Simon Bolívar (1783-1830) is generally considered to be their most prominent leader. Not only was “The Liberator” a military man and political founder of new nations, he was also an intellectual who developed a clear and prescient understanding of the challenges that lay ahead for Latin America not just in his own time but well into the future. Bolívar gained his philosophical, historical, and geographical perspective from both book-learning and extensive travels throughout much of Europe and the United States. Frequently citing the French Enlightenment philosopher Montesquieu (1689-1755) in his political writings, Bolívar believed that good laws and institutions were not the sorts of things that should simply be copied. Rather they must be carefully adapted to particular historical, geographical, and cultural realities. In this light, Bolívar perceived that the immediate costs of Latin American independence included anarchy, chaos, and a general lack of both personal and political virtue. He thus sought to create strong but subtle forms of centralized power capable of balancing new political freedoms. At the same time he sought to establish an educational system capable of developing an autonomous, independent national consciousness from a heteronomous and dependent colonial consciousness that had never been permitted to practice the art of government. Bolívar’s passionate calls for freedom and equality for all Latin Americans, including the emancipation of slaves, were thus consistently coupled with reasons that justified the concentration of authority in a small, well-educated group of mostly criollo elite. The result was that colonial socioeconomic structures remained firmly intact even after independence, leaving a gap between the ideals of liberty and the practical reality experienced by most people.
By the middle of the nineteenth century, most Latin American countries were no longer colonies, although a few did not achieve independence until considerably later (for example, Cuba in 1898). Nevertheless, there was a widespread sense even among political and intellectual elites that complete independence had not been achieved. Many thinkers framed the problem in terms of a distinction been the political independence that had already been achieved and the mental or cultural emancipation that remained as the task for a new generation. By developing their own diagnosis of the lingering colonial mindset, this generation sought to give birth to a new American culture, literature, and philosophy. Some of the most important were: Andrés Bello (1781-1865) in Venezuela, Francisco Bilbao (1823-1865) and José Victorino Lastarria (1817-1888) in Chile, Juan Bautista Alberdi (1810-1884) and Domingo Faustino Sarmiento (1811-1888) in Argentina, Gabino Barreda (1818-1881) in Mexico, Juan Montalvo (1833-1889) in Ecuador, Manuel González Prada (1844-1918) in Peru, and Luis Pereira Barreto (1840-1923) in Brazil. Among these thinkers, Juan Bautista Alberdi was the first to explicitly address the question of the character and future of Latin American philosophy, which he believed to be intimately linked with the character and future of the Latin American people. (It is worth reiterating the fact that the term “Latin America” still did not exist and that Alberdi spoke about the future of “American philosophy” as a reflection of the “American people” without meaning to include the philosophy or people of the United States). For Alberdi, Latin American philosophy should be used an intellectual tool for developing an understanding of the most vital social, political, religious, and economic problems facing the people of Latin America. (It is worth nothing that Alberdi’s references to “the people” of Latin America were aimed primarily at his fellow criollos, implicitly excluding the non-white majority of the population). Alberdi’s Foundations and Points of Departure for the Political Organization of the Republic of Argentina served as one of the major foundations for Argentina’s 1853 Constitution, which with amendments remains in force to this day.
Almost all of the thinkers from the generation that sought intellectual and cultural emancipation from the colonial past came to identify with the philosophy of positivism, which dominated much of the intellectual landscape of Latin America throughout the second half of the nineteenth century. Strictly speaking, positivism originated in Europe with the French philosopher Auguste Comte (1798-1859), but it was warmly welcomed by many Latin American intellectuals who saw Comte’s motto of “order and progress” as a European version of what they had been struggling for themselves. While adapting positivism to their own regional conditions, they presented it optimistically as a philosophy based upon an experimental and scientific method that could modernize both the economy and the educational system in order to produce social and political stability. The influence of positivism on Latin America is perhaps most vividly portrayed in Brazil’s current flag, adopted in 1889, which features the words Ordem e Progresso (Order and Progress). However, the literal adoption of Comte’s motto masks the fact that the meaning of positivism in Latin America underwent considerable change under the influence of the English philosopher Herbert Spencer (1820-1903) and others who both sought to reformulate positivism in light of Darwinian evolutionary theory. This later variety of evolutionary positivism was also frequently called materialism, characterized by its rejection of dualist and idealist metaphysics, its mechanistic philosophy of history, its promotion of intense industrial competition as the primary means of material progress, and its frequent explanation of various social and political problems in biological terms of racial characteristics. While the precise understanding of positivism differed from thinker to thinker and the scope of positivism’s influence varied from country to country, there is little question of its overall importance.
The history of positivism in Mexico can be used to illustrate the shifting meaning of positivism in a particular national context. Gabino Barreda (1818-1881) founded the National Preparatory School in Mexico City in 1868 and made a modified form of Comte’s positivism the basis of its curriculum. Barreda understood Mexico’s social disorder to be a direct reflection of intellectual disorder, which he sought to reorganize in its entirety under the authority of President Benito Juárez. Like Comte, Barreda wanted to place all education in the service of moral, social, and economic progress. Unlike Comte, Barreda interpreted political liberalism as an expression of the positive spirit, modifying Comte’s famous motto to read: “Liberty as the means; order as the base; progress as the end.” The philosophical positions held by the second generation of Mexican positivists were quite different, even though they all hailed Barreda as their teacher. Eventually, many of them joined the científicos, a circle of technocratic advisors to the dictator Porfirio Díaz. The most famous among them, Justo Sierra (1848-1912), developed his philosophy of Mexican history using Spencer’s theory of evolution in an attempt to accelerate the evolution of Mexico through a kind of social engineering. Although Sierra initially judged Porfirio Díaz’s dictatorship to be necessary in order to secure the order necessary to make progress possible, in the final years of his life Sierra cast doubt upon both positivism and the dictatorship it had been used to support.
One of the earliest critics of positivism in Latin America was the Cuban philosopher Jose Martí (1853-1895). His criticism was linked to a different vision of what he called Nuestra América (Our America”), reclaiming the word “America” from the way it is commonly used to refer exclusively to the United States of America. Whereas positivists or materialists tended to explain the evolutionary backwardness of Latin America in terms of the biological backwardness of the races that constituted the majority of its population, Martí pointed to the ongoing international history of political and economic policies that systematically disadvantaged these same people. Like Juan Bautista Alberdi had done a generation before, Martí called for Latin American intellectuals to develop their own understanding of the most vital social, political, religious, and economic problems facing the Latin American people. Unlike Alberdi, Martí took a more positive and inclusive view of Latin American identity by giving indios, mestizos, negros, and mulatos a place alongside criollos in the task of building a truly free Latin America. According to Marti, the ongoing failure of the United States to grant equality to Native Americans and former slaves in the construction of its America was just as dangerous to imitate as the European political model. Unfortunately, Martí died young in the Cuban war to gain political independence from Spain, but as an idealist he believed that powerful ideas like liberty must play an equal role in freeing Latin America from the imperialistic impulses of both Europe and the United States.
A backlash against the intellectual hegemony of positivism marks the beginning of the twentieth century in Latin America. The “scientific” nature of positivism was charged with being “scientistic;” materialism was challenged by new forms of idealism and vitalism; and evolutionism was criticized by various social and political philosophies that supported revolution. As the century wore on, there was a dramatic proliferation of philosophical currents so that speaking of Latin American philosophy as a whole becomes increasingly difficult. Ironically, this difficulty arises during the very same period that the term “Latin America” first began to achieve widespread use in public and academic discourse, and the period that the first historical treatments of Latin American philosophy appeared. In response to the problems inherent in speaking of Latin American philosophy as a whole, scholars have narrowed their scope by writing about the history of twentieth century philosophy in a particular Latin American country (especially Mexico, Argentina, or Brazil); in a particular region (for example, Central America or the Caribbean); in a particular philosophical tradition (for example, Marxism, phenomenology, existentialism, neo-scholasticism, historicism, philosophy of liberation, analytic philosophy, or feminist philosophy); or in and through a list of important figures. Alternatively, attempts to provide a more panoramic vision of Latin American philosophy in the twentieth century typically proceed by delineating somewhere between three and six generations or periods. For the sake of continuity in scope and detail, the present article utilizes this method and follows a six-generation schema that assigns a rough year to each generation based upon when they were writing rather than when they were born (modeled upon Beorlegui 2006).
The members of the first twentieth-century generational group of 1900 are often called “the generation of founders” or “the generation of patriarchs,” following the influential terminology of Francisco Romero or Francisco Miró Quesada, respectively. Members of this generation include José Enrique Rodó (1871-1917) and Carlos Vaz Ferreira (1872-1958) in Uruguay, Alejandro Korn (1860-1936) in Argentina; Alejandro Deústua (1849-1945) in Peru; Raimundo de Farias Brito (1862-1917) in Brazil; Enrique José Varona (1849-1933) in Cuba; and Enrique Molina Garmendia (1871-1964) in Chile. The year of 1900 conveniently refers to the change of century and marks the publication of Rodó’s Ariel, which exerted tremendous influence on other Latin American intellectuals. Like those that had come before them, Rodó and the other members of this generation did not write primarily for other philosophers but rather for a broader public in an attempt to influence the courses of their countries. Like Jose Martí, Rodó criticized a particular form of positivism or materialism, which he associated with the United States or Anglo-Saxon America and presented in the barbaric character of “Caliban” from Shakespeare’s The Tempest. In contrast, Rodó presents the civilized “Ariel” as the Latin American spirit of idealism that values art, sentiment, philosophy, and critical thinking. Rodó thus recommends a return to the classical values of ancient Greece and the best of contemporary European (especially French) philosophy. This recommendation is presented in contrast to what Rodó calls nordomanía or the manic delatinization of America, that is, the growing but unthinking imitation of the United States, its plutocracy, and its reductively material and individualist understandings of success.
The members of the generation of 1915 are often grouped with the previous generation of “founders” or “patriarchs” but they are presented here separately because they represent a growing interest in the mestizo or indigenous dimensions of Latin American identity. As it had since colonial times, Latin American philosophy in the twentieth century continued to connect many of its philosophical and political problems to the identity of its peoples. But in light of events like the Mexican revolution that began in 1910, some thinkers began to rebel against the historical tendency to view mestizos and indigenous peoples as negative elements to be overcome through ongoing assimilation and European immigration. Principal members of this generation include Antonio Caso (1883-1946), José Vasconcelos (1882-1959), and Alfonso Reyes (1889-1959) in Mexico; Pedro Henríquez Ureña (1884-1946) in Dominican Republic; Cariolano Alberini (1886-1960) in Argentina; Víctor Raúl Haya de la Torre (1895-1979) and José Carlos Mariátegui (1894-1930) in Peru. The first four thinkers just listed were members of the famous Atheneum of Youth, an intellectual and artistic group founded in 1909 that is crucial for understanding Mexican culture in the twentieth century. Drawing upon Rodó’s Ariel—as well as other American and European philosophers including Henri Bergson (1859–1941), Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900), and William James (1842-1910)—the Atheneum developed a sweeping criticism of the reigning positivism of the científicos and began to take Latin American philosophy in new directions. The members of the Atheneum also explicitly linked their intellectual revolution to Mexico’s social revolution, thereby recapitulating the nineteenth century concern to achieve both political independence and mental emancipation. Jose Vasconcelos’ most famous work, The Cosmic Race (1925), presents a vision of Mexico and Latin America more generally as the birthplace of a new mixed race whose mission would be to usher in a new age by ethnically and spiritually fusing all of the existing races. Vasconcelos subsumed the 1910 Mexican Revolution in a larger world-historical vision of the New World in which Mexicans and other Latin American peoples would redeem humanity from its long history of violence, achieve political stability, and undertake the integral spiritual development of humankind (replacing prevailing notions of human progress as merely materialistic or technological).
Focusing on Indians rather than mestizos, José Carlos Mariátegui offered a vision of Peru and Indo-America (his preferred term for Latin America) that would reverse the disastrous social and economic effects of the conquest. One of the most important Marxist thinkers in the history of Latin America, Mariátegui tied the future of Peru to the socialist liberation of its indigenous peasants, who made up the vast majority of the country’s population and whose lives were only made worse by national independence. Unlike orthodox scientific Marxists, Mariátegui believed that aesthetics and spirituality had a key role to play in fueling the revolution by uniting various marginalized peoples in the belief that they could create a new, more egalitarian society. Furthermore, Mariátegui grounded his analysis in the historical and cultural conditions of the Andean region, which had developed indigenous forms of agrarian communism destroyed by the Spanish colonizers. Seven Interpretive Essays on Peruvian Reality, published in 1928, highlights the Indian character of Peru and offers a structural interpretation of the ongoing exploitation of indigenous peoples as rooted in the usurpation of their communal lands. Mariátegui argued that administrative, educational, and humanitarian approaches to overcoming the suffering of Indians will necessarily fail unless they overcome the local racialized class system that operates in the larger context of global capitalism.
The members of the third twentieth-century generational group of 1930 are often called the “forgers” or the “shapers” (depending upon the translation of Miró Quesada’s influential term forjadores). Members include Samuel Ramos (1897-1959) and José Gaos (1900-1969) in Mexico; Francisco Romero (1891-1962) and Carlos Astrada (1894-1970) in Argentina; and Juan David García Bacca (1901-1992) in Venezuela. After the first two generations of “founders” or “patriarchs” had criticized positivism in order to develop their own personal versions of the philosophic enterprise, the forjadores developed the philosophical foundations and institutions that they took to be necessary for bringing their authentically Latin American philosophical projects to the far better-recognized level of European philosophy. Mariátegui can be understood as a precursor in this respect, since his philosophical influences were primarily European, but his philosophy was rooted in a distinctively Peruvian reality. In their quest to philosophize from a distinctively Latin American perspective, many of the forjadores were greatly influenced by the “perspectivism” of the Spanish philosopher José Ortega y Gasset (1883-1955). Ortega’s impact on Latin American philosophy only increased—particularly in Mexico, Argentina, and Venezuela—with the arrival of Spaniards exiled during the Spanish Civil War (1936-1939). José Gaos was undoubtedly the most influential of these transterrados (transplants), who helped found new educational institutions, publish new academic journals, establish new publishing houses, and translate hundreds of works in Ancient and European philosophy.
The long philosophical career of Juan David García Bacca illustrates the shifting philosophical currents and geographic displacements that forged new developments in Latin American philosophy. Author of over five hundred philosophical works and translations, García Bacca received his philosophical training in Spain, largely under the influence of neo-scholasticism until Ortega woke him from his dogmatic slumber. García Bacca spent the first years of his exile (1938-1941) in Quito, Ecuador, where he began to deconstruct the Aristotelian or Thomistic conception of human nature and replace it with an understanding of man as historical, technological, and transfinite. In other words, García Bacca presented human beings as finite creatures who are nevertheless godlike in their infinite capacity to recreate themselves. In 1941, García Bacca accepted an invitation from the National Autonomous University of Mexico (UNAM) to teach a course on the philosophy of the influential German existentialist and phenomenologist Martin Heidegger (1889-1976). In 1946, García Bacca along with other transterrados founded the Department of Philosophy at the Central University of Venezuela, where he continued to work out his philosophy in dialogue with the traditions of historicism, vitalism, phenomenology, hermeneutics, and existentialism. Following a broad intellectual trend in Latin America after the Cuban revolution of 1959, his understanding of the Latin American context was transformed under the influence of Marxism beginning in the 1960s. García Bacca gave his understanding of human nature as transfinite a substantially new twist by requiring nothing less than the transformation of human nature under socialism. Once again indicating broad intellectual trends in the 1980s, García Bacca began distancing himself somewhat from Marxism and contributed greatly to the history of philosophy in Latin America by publishing substantial anthologies of philosophical thought in Venezuela and Colombia.
Given the tremendous progress in the institutionalization of Latin American philosophy from roughly 1940 until 1960, this period is frequently referred to as that of “normalization” (again following the influential periodization of Francisco Romero). The generation that benefited was the first to consistently receive formal academic training in philosophy in order to become professors in an established system of universities. These philosophers developed an increasing consciousness of Latin American philosophical identity, aided in part by increased travel and dialogue between Latin American countries and universities (some of it forced under politically oppressive conditions that led to exile). Members of this fourth generation include Risieri Frondizi (1910-1985) and Augusto Salazar Bondy (1925-1974) in Argentina; Miguel Reale (1910-2006) in Brazil; Francisco Miró Quesada (1918- ) in Peru; Arturo Ardao (1912-2003) in Uruguay; and Leopoldo Zea (1912-2004) and Luis Villoro (1922- ) in Mexico. Building upon the philosophies of their teachers, as well as the philosophical conception of hispanidad that many inherited from the Spanish philosophers Miguel de Unamuno (1864-1936) and Ortega y Gasset, this generation developed a critical philosophical perspective that is often called “Latin Americanism.” The philosophy of Leopold Zea is widely taken to be exemplary of this approach. Under the influence of Samuel Ramos and the direction of Jose Gaós at the UNAM, Zea defended his 1944 dissertation on the rise and fall of positivism in Mexico, later translated as Positivism in Mexico (1974). In 1949, Zea founded the famous Hyperion Group of philosophers seeking to shed light upon Mexican identity and reality. Convinced that the past must be known and understood in order to construct an authentic future, Zea went on to situate his work in a panoramic philosophical view of Latin American history, drawing upon the earlier works of Bolívar, Alberdi, Martí, and many others. Zea’s extensive travels and ongoing professional dialogue with other Latin American philosophers across the Continent resulted in many works, including one translated as The Latin American Mind (1963). He also edited a series of works by other scholars on the history of ideas across Latin America, published by El Fondo de Cultura Económica, Mexico’s largest publishing house. Anticipating themes that marked future generations of Latin American philosophy, Zea’s later works such as Latin America and the World (1969) thematized the concepts of marginalization and liberation while situating Latin American philosophy in a global context. In short, Zea consistently sought to develop a Latin American philosophy that would be capable of grasping Latin America’s concrete history and present circumstances in an authentic, responsible, and ultimately universal way.
Zea’s quest for an authentic Latin American philosophy emerged as part of a larger debate over the nature of Latin American philosophy and whether it was something more than an imitation of European philosophy. An examination of one of Zea’s most famous opponents in this debate—Augusto Salazar Bondy—will help set the stage for the subsequent discussion of the philosophies of liberation that emerged in the 1970s with the next philosophical generation. Bondy lays out his position in his book, ¿Existe una filosofía de nuestra América? (1968) [Does a Philosophy of Our America Exist?]. Bondy attacks what he takes to be Zea’s ungrounded idealism and maintains that the existence of an authentic Latin American philosophy is inseparable from the concrete socioeconomic conditions of Latin America, which place it in a situation of dependence and economic underdevelopment in relation to Europe and the United States. This in turn produces a “defective culture” in which inauthentic intellectual works are mistaken for authentic philosophical productions. The problem is not that Latin American philosophy fails to be rooted in concrete reality (a problem that Zea works painstakingly to overcome), but rather that it is concretely rooted in an alienated and divided socioeconomic reality. According to Bondy, the authenticity of Latin American philosophy depends upon the liberation of Latin America from the economic production of its cultural dependence. At the same time, Bondy argues for the inauthenticity of philosophy in Europe and the United States insofar as they depend upon the domination of the Third World. In sum, whereas Zea calls for an authentic philosophical development in Latin America that would critically assimilate the deficiencies of the past, Bondy maintains that liberation from economic domination and cultural dependence is a prerequisite for authentic Latin American philosophy in the future.
Before turning to the next philosophical generation and their philosophies of liberation, it is important to note that there are other major philosophical strands that emerged during the period of normalization (1940-1960). While the period is generally associated with Latin Americanism—which drew upon historicism, existentialism, and phenomenology—other philosophical traditions including Marxism, neo-scholasticism, and analytic philosophy also grew in importance. Important early Latin American analytic philosophers include Vicente Ferreira da Silva (1916-1963) in Brazil, who published work in mathematical logic; Mario Bunge (1919- ) in Argentina and then Canada, who has published extensively in almost all major areas of analytic philosophy; and Héctor-Neri Castañeda (1924-1991) in Guatemala and then the United States, who was a student Wilfrid Sellars (1912-1989) and founded one of the top journals in analytic philosophy, Noûs. Analytic philosophy was further institutionalized in Latin America during the 1960s, especially in Argentina and Mexico, followed by Brazil in the 1970s. In Argentina, Gregorio Kilmovsky (1922-2009) cultivated interest in the philosophy of science, Tomás Moro Simpson (1929- ) did important work in the philosophy of language, and Carlos Alchourrón’s (1931-1996) work on logic and belief revision had an international impact on analytic philosophy and computer science. In Mexico, the Institute of Philosophical Investigations (IIF) and the journal Crítica were both founded in 1967 and continue to serve as focal points for analytic philosophy in Latin America. Notable philosophers at the IIF include Fernando Salmerón (1925-1997), whose major influence was in ethics; Alejandro Rossi (1932-2009), who worked in philosophy of language; and Luis Villoro (1922- ), who works primarily in epistemology and political philosophy. The development of analytic philosophy in Brazil was shaken by the 1964 coup, but resumed in the 1970s. Newton da Costa (1929- ) developed several non-classical logics, most famously paraconsistent logic where certain contradictions are allowed. Oswaldo Chateaubriand (1940- ) has done internationally recognized work in logic, metaphysics, and philosophy of language. Since then, analytic philosophy has continued to grow and develop in Latin America, leading more recently to the 2007 founding of the Asociación Latinoamericana de Filosofía Analítica, whose mission is to promote analytic philosophy through scholarly conferences and other exchanges across Latin America.
After the 1960s, philosophy as a professional academic discipline was well established in Latin America, but it only began to achieve substantial international visibility in the 1970s with the rise of a new generation that developed the philosophy of liberation. The most famous members of this fifth twentieth century generation are from Argentina and include Arturo Andrés Roig (1922-2012), Enrique Dussel (1934- ), and Horacio Cerutti Guldberg (1950- ). The strain of liberation philosophy developed by Ignacio Ellacuría (1930-1989) in El Salvador also stands out as exemplary. In a context marked by violence and political repression, the public philosophical positions of these liberatory thinkers put their lives in jeopardy. Most tragically, Ellacuría was assassinated by a military death squad while chairing the philosophy department of El Salvador’s Universidad Centroamericana. The substantial international impact of the Argentine philosophers of liberation stems in part from their political exile due to the military and state terrorism that characterized the “Dirty War” from 1972-1983. Much like the earlier Spanish transterrados, these philosophers developed and spread their philosophies from their newly adopted countries (Ecuador in the case of Roig, and Mexico in the cases of Dussel and Cerutti Guldberg). Although it should not be confused with the better-known tradition of Latin American liberation theology, Latin American philosophies of liberation emerged from a similar historical and intellectual context that included: a recovery of Latin America’s longstanding preoccupation with political liberation and intellectual independence, the influence of dependency theory in economics, a careful engagement with Marxism, and an emphasis on praxis rooted in an ethical commitment to the liberation of poor or otherwise oppressed groups in the Third World. Yet another parallel strain of Latin American liberationist thought focusing on pedagogy emerged based upon the work of Brazilian philosopher and educator Paulo Freire (1921-1997). Imprisoned and then exiled from Brazil during the military coup of 1964, he developed a vision and method for teaching oppressed peoples (who were often illiterate) how to theorize and practice their own liberation from the dehumanizing socioeconomic conditions that had been imposed upon them. Freire’s book Pedagogy of the Oppressed (1970) drew international attention and became a foundational text in what is now called critical pedagogy.
While Cerutti Guldberg has written the most complete work explaining the intellectual splits that produced different philosophies of liberation—Filosofía de la liberación latinoamericana (2006)—Dussel’s name and work are most widely known given his tremendous efforts to promote the philosophy of liberation through dialogue with famous European philosophers including Karl-Otto Apel (1922- ) and Jurgen Habermas (1929) as well as famous North American philosophers including Richard Rorty (1931-2007) and Charles Taylor (1931- ). By analyzing the relationship between Latin American cultural-intellectual dependence and socioeconomic oppression, Dussel seeks to develop transformational conceptions and practices leading to liberation from both of these conditions. Dussel argues that the progress of European philosophy through the centuries has come at the expense of the vast majority of humanity, whose massive poverty has only rarely appeared as a fundamental philosophical theme. Dussel’s best-known early work Philosophy of Liberation (1980) attempts to foreground, diagnose, and transform the oppressive socioeconomic and intellectual systems that are largely controlled by European and North American interests and power groups at the expense of Third World regions including Latin America. Instead of only pretending to be universal, at the expense of most people who are largely ignored, historical and philosophical progress must be rooted in a global dialogue committed to recognizing and listening to the least heard on their own terms. Influenced by the French philosopher Immanuel Levinas (1906-1995), Dussel highlights the importance of this ethical method, which he calls analectical to contrast it with the totalizing tendencies of the Hegelian dialectic. A prolific author of more than fifty books, Dussel’s later work attempts to systematically develop philosophical principles for a critical ethics of liberation alongside a critical politics of liberation. Dussel’s 1998 book, Ethics of Liberation in the Age of Globalization and Exclusion (translated in 2013), is often cited as an important later work.
While not typically categorized as part of the philosophy of liberation in the narrow sense, Latin American feminist philosophy is an important but typically under-recognized form of emancipatory thought that has existed in academic form for at least a century. In 1914, Carlos Vaz Ferreira (1872-1958) began publicly analyzing and discussing the importance of civil and political rights for women, as well as women’s access to education and professional careers. Vaz Ferreira’s feminist philosophy was published as Sobre feminismo in 1933, the same year that woman gained the right to vote in Uruguay. Given that Vaz Ferreira belongs to the first twentieth century generation of the “patriarchs” of Latin American philosophy, it is worth emphasizing that women were systematically marginalized from the academic discipline of philosophy until much later in the twentieth century, when the feminist movements of the 1970s led to the institutionalization of Women’s Studies or Gender Studies in Latin American universities in the 1980s and 1990s. An important connecting tissue for these movements has been the Encuentros Feminista Latinoamericano y del Caribe, an ongoing series of biennial (later triennial) meetings of Latin American women and feminist activists, first held in 1981 in Bogotá, Colombia. While the diversity that characterizes feminism makes it problematic to make generalized comparisons between Latin American feminism and feminism in Europe and the United States, Latin American feminists have tended to be more concerned with the context of family life and to giving equal importance to ethnicity and class as categories of analysis (Femenías and Oliver 2007).
One of the earliest and most influential Latin American feminist philosophers was Graciela Hierro (1928-2003), who introduced feminist philosophy into the academic curriculum of the UNAM beginning in the 1970s and organized the first panel on feminism at a national Mexican philosophy conference in 1979. Hierro is best remembered for the feminist ethics of pleasure that she developed beginning with her book Ética y feminismo (1985). Criticizing the “double sexual morality” that assigns asymmetrical moral roles based upon gender, Hierro argues for a hedonistic sexual ethic rooted in a love of self that makes prudence, solidarity, justice, and equity possible. The rise of feminist philosophy alongside other feminist social and intellectual movements in Latin America has also led to the recovery and popularization of writings by marginalized women thinkers, including the work of Sor Juana de la Cruz (1651-1695) discussed above. Another important intellectual resource has been the development of oral history projects or testimonios that seek to document the lives and ideas of countless women living in poverty or obscurity. One of the most famous books in this genre is I, Rigoberta Menchú (1983), the testimonial autobiography of a Quiche Mayan woman, Rigoberta Menchú Tum (1959- ), who began fighting for the rights of women and indigenous people in Guatemala as a teenager and went on to win a Nobel Peace Prize in 1992.
The sixth and last generation of twentieth century Latin American philosophers emerged in the 1980s. While speaking of broad trends is always somewhat misleading given the diversity of approaches and interests, one interesting trend lies in how Latin American philosophers from this generation have contributed to the analysis and criticism of globalization by participating in new intellectual debates concerning postmodernism in the 1980s and postcolonialism in the 1990s. For example, some new philosophers of liberation like Raul Fornet-Betancourt (1946- ) sought to revise fundamental theoretical dichotomies such as center/periphery, domination/liberation, and First World/Third World that were critical in terms of their general thrust but insufficiently nuanced in light of the complex phenomena that go by the name of globalization. Fornet-Betancourt’s own biography points to this complexity, since he was born in Cuba but moved to Germany in 1972, earning his college degree and first PhD in philosophy in Spain, then returning to complete a second PhD in theology and linguistics in Germany, where he is currently a professor who publishes extensively in both German and Spanish. Self-critical of much of his own philosophical training and development, Fornet-Betancourt has rooted himself in Latin American philosophy in order to devise an intercultural approach to understanding philosophy in light of the diverse histories and cultures that have produced human wisdom across time and space. In contrast to globalization, which is a function of a global political economy that does not tolerate differences or alternatives to a global monoculture of capitalism and consumption, Fornet-Betancourt outlines the economic and political conditions that would make genuinely symmetrical intercultural dialogue and exchange possible.
Drawing critically upon discussions of globalization and postmodernism, the discourse of postcolonialism emerged in the final decade of the twentieth century. The basic idea is that globalization has produced a new transnational system of economic colonialism that is distinct from but related to the national and international forms of colonialism that characterized the world between the conquest of America and the Second World War. Among other things, postcolonialism addresses the politics of knowledge in globalized world that is unified by complex webs of exclusion based upon gender, class, race, ethnicity, language, and sexuality. One of the fundamental criticisms leveled by postcolonialism is the way that neo-colonial discourses routinely and violently construct homogeneous wholes like “The Third World” or “Latin America” out of heterogeneous peoples, places, and their cultures. Like postmodernism, postcolonial theory did not initially come from or focus on Latin America, so there is considerable debate about whether or how postcolonial theory should be developed in a Latin American context. A variant of this debate has occurred among Latin American feminists who do not generally view themselves as part of postcolonial feminism, which has been charged with overlooking tremendous differences between the former English and French colonies and the former Spanish and Portuguese colonies (Schutte and Femenías 2010). One of the best-known Latin American thinkers who works critically in conjunction with postcolonial studies is Walter Mignolo (1941- ). He was born in Argentina, where he completed his B.A. in philosophy before moving to Paris to obtain his Ph.D., eventually becoming a professor in the United States. Rather than apply foreign postcolonial theory to the Latin American context, Mignolo has mined the history of Latin America for authors who found ways to challenge or subversively employ the rules of colonial discourse, for example, the native Andean intellectual and artist Felipe Guamán Poma de Ayala (c.1550-1616) discussed above. Mignolo’s book, The Idea of Latin America (2005), excavates the history of how the idea of Latin America came about in order to show how it still rests upon colonial foundations that must be transformed by decolonial theory and practice.
In the early twenty-first century, Latin America became home to the ongoing development and institutionalization of many philosophical traditions and approaches including analytic philosophy, Latin Americanism, phenomenology, existentialism, hermeneutics, Marxism, neo-scholasticism, feminism, history of philosophy, philosophy of liberation, postmodernism, and postcolonialism. At the same time, the very idea of Latin America has been posed as a major problem (Mignolo 2005), following historically in the wake of the still unresolved controversy over how philosophy itself should be understood. While the dominant philosophical currents and trends differ both across and within various Latin American countries and regions, all of the major philosophical approaches that predominate in Europe and the United States are well-represented.
The term “Latin American philosophy” has also gained widespread use and attracted considerable research interest in the United States. This is due in large measure to the efforts of a generation of Latino and Latina philosophers who were born in Latin America and went on to become professors in the United States where they teach and publish in better-established philosophical fields as well as in Latin American philosophy. These philosophers include Walter Mignolo (1941- ), María Lugones (1948- ), and Susana Nuccetelli (1954-) from Argentina; Jorge J. E. Gracia (1942- ) and Ofelia Schutte (1945- ) from Cuba; Linda Martín Alcoff (1955- ) from Panama; and Eduardo Mendieta (1963- ) from Colombia. Their philosophical interests and approaches to Latin American philosophy vary greatly and include postcolonial theory, feminism, metaphysics, epistemology, critical philosophy of race, philosophy of liberation, philosophy of language, metaphilosophy, continental philosophy, and critical theory. This generation has also made important contributions to the analysis of, and debate over, Hispanic or Latino/a identity in the United States, especially as it intersects with other complex dimensions of identity including race, ethnicity, nationality, class, language, gender, and sexual orientation.
Borrowing a term from the history of Latin American philosophy, we may eventually be able to speak of the early twenty-first century as the period of normalization for Latin American philosophy in the United States. Given the accomplishments of the generation of mostly Latino and Latina founders, a few philosophy graduate students in the United States have been the first presented with opportunities to receive some formal training in Latin American philosophy and to make it a major part of their research agenda early in their careers. Moreover, the first handful of job listings at universities in the United States have emerged calling for professors who specialize in Latin American philosophy. The early twenty-first century has also been marked by an increasing number of English-language articles and books on Latin American philosophy. Nevertheless, if this trend toward more development of Latin American philosophy is to continue, then large hurdles remain, including a major shortage of primary Latin American philosophical texts available in English translation, a widespread lack of knowledge concerning Latin American philosophy among most professional philosophers in the United States, and the resulting need for most U.S. philosophers interested in Latin American philosophy to maintain an active research agenda and publication record in at least one better-recognized philosophical area or field.
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- Alcoff, Linda Martín. Visible Identities: Race, Gender, and the Self. New York: Oxford University Press, 2006.
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- Bolívar, Simón. El Libertador: Writings of Simón Bolívar. Translated by Frederick H. Fornoff. Edited by David Bushnell. New York: Oxford University Press, 2003.
- Bondy, Augusto Salazar. ¿Existe una filosofía de nuestra américa? México: Siglo XXI, 1968.
- Burke, Janet, and Ted Humphrey, eds. Nineteenth-Century Nation Building and the Latin American Intellectual Tradition: A Reader. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2007.
- Cerutti Guldberg, Horacio. Filosofía de la liberación latinoamericana. México: Fondo de Cultura Económica, 2006.
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Alexander V. Stehn
University of Texas-Pan American
U. S. A.