Latin American Philosophy

This article outlines the history of Latin American philosophy: the thinking of its indigenous peoples, the debates over conquest and colonization, the arguments for national independence in the eighteenth century, the challenges of nation-building and modernization in the nineteenth century, the concerns over various forms of development in the twentieth century, and the diverse interests in Latin American philosophy during the opening decades of the twenty-first century. Rather than attempt to provide an exhaustive and impossibly long list of scholars’ names and dates, this article outlines the history of Latin American philosophy while trying to provide a meaningful sense of detail by focusing briefly on individual thinkers whose work points to broader philosophical trends that are inevitably more complex and diverse than any encyclopedic treatment can hope to capture.

The term “Latin American philosophy” refers broadly to philosophy in, from, or about Latin America. However, the definitions of both “Latin America” and “philosophy” are historically fluid and contested, leading to even more disagreement when combined. “Latin America” typically refers to the geographic areas on the American continent where languages derived from Latin are widely spoken: Portuguese in Brazil, and Spanish in most of Central America, South America, and parts of the Caribbean. The French-speaking parts of the Caribbean are sometimes included as well, but all mainland North American regions north of the Rio Grande are excluded in spite of French being widely spoken in Canada. Although it is anachronistic to speak of Latin American philosophy before the 1850s when the term “Latin America” first entered usage, most scholars agree that Latin American philosophy extends at least as far back as the sixteenth century when the Spanish founded the first schools and seminaries in the “New World”. Given this widespread agreement that there was “Latin American philosophy” before anyone was using the term “Latin America,” many scholars have argued for including pre-Columbian and pre-Cabralian thought in the history of Latin American philosophy. A number of indigenous cultures (particularly the Aztecs, Mayas, Incas, and Tupi-Guarani) produced sophisticated systems of thought long before Europeans arrived with their own understanding of “philosophy.”

The scholarly debate over whether or not to include indigenous thought in the history of Latin American philosophy reveals that the question of what constitutes Latin American philosophy hinges upon both our understanding of what constitutes Latin America and our understanding of what constitutes philosophy. It is worthwhile to remember that these and other labels are the products of human activity and dispute, not the result of a pre-ordained teleological process. Just as “America” was not called “America” by its indigenous inhabitants, the term “Latin America” emerged in the nineteenth century from outside of the region in French intellectual circles. The term competed against terms like “Ibero-America” until “Latin America” gained widespread and largely unquestioned usage in public and academic discourse in the second half of the twentieth century. More than a debate over mere terms, Latin American philosophy demonstrates a longstanding preoccupation with the identity of Latin America itself and a lively debate over the authenticity of its philosophy. Given the history of colonialism in the region, much of the history of Latin American philosophy analyzes ethical and sociopolitical issues, frequently treating concrete problems of practical concern like education or political revolution.

Table of Contents

  1. Indigenous Period
  2. Colonial Period
    1. Scholasticism and Debates on Conquest
    2. Post-conquest Indigenous Thought
    3. Proto-nationalism
    4. Proto-feminism
    5. Enlightenment Philosophy
  3. Nineteenth Century
    1. Political Independence
    2. Mental and Cultural Emancipation
    3. Positivism
  4. Twentieth Century
    1. Generation of 1900: Foundational Critique of Positivism
    2. Generation of 1915: New Philosophical Directions
    3. Generation of 1930: Forging Latin American Philosophy
    4. Generation of 1940: Normalization of Latin American Philosophy
    5. Generation of 1960: Philosophies of Liberation
    6. Generation of 1980: Globalization, Postmodernism, and Postcolonialism
  5. Twenty-First Century
    1. Plurality of Philosophies in Latin America
    2. Normalization of Latin American Philosophy in the United States
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Indigenous Period

Most histories of Western philosophy claim that philosophy began in ancient Greece with Thales of Miletus (c.624–c.546 B.C.E.) and other pre-Socratics who engaged in sophisticated speculation about the origins of the universe and its workings. There is ample evidence that a number of indigenous peoples in present-day Latin America also engaged in this sort of sophisticated speculation well before the 1500s when Europeans arrived to ask the question of whether it was philosophy. Moreover, a few Europeans during the early colonial period, including the Franciscan priest Bernardino de Sahagún (1499-1590), reported the existence of philosophy and philosophers among the indigenous Aztecs of colonial New Spain. In any case, whether or not most sixteenth-century European explorers, conquistadores, and missionaries believed that there were indigenous philosophies and philosophers, indigenous cultures produced sophisticated systems of thought centuries before Europeans arrived.

The largest and most notable of these indigenous civilizations are: the Aztec (in present-day central Mexico), the Maya (in present-day southern Mexico and northern Central America), and the Inca (in present-day western South America centered in Peru). Considerable challenges face scholars attempting to understand their complex systems of thought, since almost all of their texts and the other artifacts that would have testified most clearly concerning their intellectual production were systematically burned or otherwise destroyed by European missionaries who considered them idolatrous. Nevertheless, scholars have used the handful of pre-colonial codices and other available sources to reconstruct plausible interpretations of these philosophies, while remaining cognizant of the dangers inherent in using Western philosophical concepts to understand non-Western thought. See the article on Aztec Philosophy for an excellent example.

2. Colonial Period

Academic philosophy during the colonial period was dominated by scholasticism imported from the Iberian Peninsula. With the support of Charles V—the first king of Spain and Holy Roman Emperor from 1516 to 1556—schools, monasteries, convents, and seminaries were established across the Indies (as the American continent and Caribbean were known then). Mexico was the main philosophical center in the early colonial period, with Peru gaining importance in the seventeenth century. The adherents of various religious orders who taught at these centers of higher learning emphasized the texts of medieval scholastics like Thomas Aquinas and Duns Scotus, as well as their Iberian commentators, particularly those associated with the School of Salamanca, for example, Francisco de Vitoria (c.1483-1546), Domingo de Soto (1494-1560), and Francisco Suárez (1548-1617). The thoroughly medieval style and sources of their theological and philosophical disputations concerning the Indies and its peoples contrast starkly with the extraordinarily new epistemological, ethical, religious, legal, and political questions that arose over time alongside attempts to colonize and missionize the New World. Much of the philosophy developed in the Indies appeared in isolation from its social and political context. For example, there was nothing uniquely Mexican about Antonio Rubio’s (1548-1615) Logica mexicana (1605). This careful analysis of Aristotelian logic in light of recent scholastic developments brought fame to the University of Mexico when it was adopted as logic textbook back in Europe where it went through seven editions.

a. Scholasticism and Debates on Conquest

One of the most famous philosophical debates of the early colonial period concerned the supposed rights of the Spanish monarchy over the indigenous peoples of the Indies. Bartolomé de las Casas (1484-1566) debated Ginés de Sepúlveda (1490-1573) at the Council of Valladolid (1550-1551). Sepúlveda, who had never traveled to America, defended the Spanish conquest as an instance of just war, outlined the rights of the colonizers to seize native lands and possessions, and claimed that it was morally just to enslave the Indians, arguing on the basis of Thomism, Scripture, and Aristotelian philosophy. Las Casas countered Sepúlveda’s arguments by drawing upon the same theological and philosophical sources as well as decades of his own experiences living in different parts of the Indies. Las Casas argued that the war against the Indians was unjust, that neither Spain nor the Church had jurisdiction over Indians who had not accepted Christ, and that Aristotle’s category of “natural slaves” did not apply to the Indians. No formal winner of the debate was declared, but it did lead to las Casas’ most influential work, In Defense of the Indians, written from 1548-1550.

b. Post-conquest Indigenous Thought

Indigenous perspectives on some of these philosophical issues emerge in post-conquest texts that also depict pre-colonial life and history in light of more recent colonial violence. The work of Felipe Guamán Poma de Ayala (c.1550-1616), a native Andean intellectual and artist, serves as an excellent example. Written around 1615 and addressed to King Philip III of Spain, Guamán Poma’s The First New Chronicle and Good Government consists of nearly 800 pages of text in Spanish accompanied by many Quechua phrases and nearly 400 line drawings. Guamán Poma skillfully combines local histories, Spanish chronicles of conquest, Catholic moral and philosophical discourses (including those of Bartolomé de las Casas), various eyewitness accounts (including his own), and oral reports in multiple indigenous languages, to build a powerful case for maximum Indian autonomy given the ongoing history of abuse by Spanish conquerors, priests, and government officials. This and other post-conquest native texts affirm the ongoing existence of native intellectual traditions, contest the colonial European understanding of indigenous peoples as barbarians, and challenge Eurocentric views of American geography and history.

c. Proto-nationalism

As part of European conquest and colonization a new social hierarchy or caste system based on race was developed. White Spanish colonists born on the Iberian Peninsula (peninsulares) held the highest position, followed by white Spaniards born in the Indies (criollos), both of whom were far above Indians (indios) and Africans (negros) in the hierarchy. First generation individuals born to parents of different races were called mestizos (Indian and white), mulatos (African and white), and sambos (Indian and African). The subsequent mixing of already mixed generations further complicated the hierarchy and led to a remarkably complex racial terminology. In any case, higher education was almost always restricted to whites, who typically had to demonstrate the purity of their racial origins in order to enroll. By the seventeenth century, well-educated criollos were developing new perspectives on the Indies and their colonial experience. Anxious to maintain their status through intellectual ties to the Iberian Peninsula while nevertheless establishing their own place and tradition in America, these thinkers reflected on diverse topics while developing a proto-nationalist discourse that would eventually lead to independence. The work of Carlos de Sigüenza y Góngora (1645-1700) provides an interesting case of criollo ambivalence with respect to American identity. On the one hand, Sigüenza idealized Aztec society and was one of the first criollos to appropriate their past in order to articulate the uniqueness of American identity. On the other hand, this did not prevent Sigüenza from despising contemporary Indians, especially when they rioted in the streets during a food shortage in Mexico City.

d. Proto-feminism

Similar to the way in which scholars have retrospectively perceived a budding nationalism in intellectuals like Sigüenza, Sor Juana Inés de la Cruz (1651-1695) is widely regarded as a forerunner of feminist philosophy in Latin America. Just as non-whites were typically barred from higher education based on European assumptions of racial inferiority, women were not permitted access to formal education on the assumption of sexual inferiority. Basic education was provided in female convents, but their reading and writing still occurred under the supervision of male church officials and confessors. After establishing a positive reputation for knowledge across literature, history, music, languages, and natural science, Sor Juana was publicly reprimanded for entering the male-dominated world of theological debate. Under the penname of Sor Philothea de la Cruz (Sister Godlover of the Cross), the Bishop of Puebla told Sor Juana to abandon intellectual pursuits that were improper for a woman. Sor Juana’s extensive answer to Sor Philothea subtly but masterfully defends rational equality between men and women, makes a powerful case for women’s right to education, and develops an understanding of wisdom as a form of self-realization.

e. Enlightenment Philosophy

Although leading Latin American intellectuals in the eighteenth century did not completely abandon scholasticism, they began to draw upon new sources in order to think through new social and political questions. Interest grew in early modern European philosophy and the Enlightenment, especially as this “new philosophy” entered the curriculum of schools and universities. The experimental and scientific methods gained ground over the syllogism, just as appeals to scriptural or Church authority were slowly replaced by appeals to experience and reason. The rational liberation from intellectual authority that characterized the Enlightenment also fueled desires for individual liberty and national autonomy, which became defining issues in the century that followed.

3. Nineteenth Century

a. Political Independence

In the early nineteenth century, national independence movements swept through Latin America. However, some scholars have categorized these wars for independence as civil wars, since the majority of combatants on both sides were Latin Americans. Criollos, although a numerical minority (roughly 15% of the Latin American population in the early nineteenth century), led the push for political independence and clearly gained the most from it. In contrast, most of the combatants were mestizos (roughly 25% of the population) and indios (roughly 45% of the population) whose positions in society after national independence were scarcely improved and sometimes even made worse.

Scholars disagree about whether to understand changes in Latin American thought as causes or as effects of these political independence movements. In any case, Simon Bolívar (1783-1830) is generally considered to be their most prominent leader. Not only was “The Liberator” a military man and political founder of new nations, he was also an intellectual who developed a clear and prescient understanding of the challenges that lay ahead for Latin America not just in his own time but well into the future. Bolívar gained his philosophical, historical, and geographical perspective from both book-learning and extensive travels throughout much of Europe and the United States. Frequently citing the French Enlightenment philosopher Montesquieu (1689-1755) in his political writings, Bolívar believed that good laws and institutions were not the sorts of things that should simply be copied. Rather they must be carefully adapted to particular historical, geographical, and cultural realities. In this light, Bolívar perceived that the immediate costs of Latin American independence included anarchy, chaos, and a general lack of both personal and political virtue. He thus sought to create strong but subtle forms of centralized power capable of balancing new political freedoms. At the same time he sought to establish an educational system capable of developing an autonomous, independent national consciousness from a heteronomous and dependent colonial consciousness that had never been permitted to practice the art of government. Bolívar’s passionate calls for freedom and equality for all Latin Americans, including the emancipation of slaves, were thus consistently coupled with reasons that justified the concentration of authority in a small, well-educated group of mostly criollo elite. The result was that colonial socioeconomic structures remained firmly intact even after independence, leaving a gap between the ideals of liberty and the practical reality experienced by most people.

b. Mental and Cultural Emancipation

By the middle of the nineteenth century, most Latin American countries were no longer colonies, although a few did not achieve independence until considerably later (for example, Cuba in 1898). Nevertheless, there was a widespread sense even among political and intellectual elites that complete independence had not been achieved. Many thinkers framed the problem in terms of a distinction been the political independence that had already been achieved and the mental or cultural emancipation that remained as the task for a new generation. By developing their own diagnosis of the lingering colonial mindset, this generation sought to give birth to a new American culture, literature, and philosophy. Some of the most important were: Andrés Bello (1781-1865) in Venezuela,  Francisco Bilbao (1823-1865) and José Victorino Lastarria (1817-1888) in Chile, Juan Bautista Alberdi (1810-1884) and Domingo Faustino Sarmiento (1811-1888) in Argentina, Gabino Barreda (1818-1881) in Mexico, Juan Montalvo (1833-1889) in Ecuador, Manuel González Prada (1844-1918) in Peru, and Luis Pereira Barreto (1840-1923) in Brazil. Among these thinkers, Juan Bautista Alberdi was the first to explicitly address the question of the character and future of Latin American philosophy, which he believed to be intimately linked with the character and future of the Latin American people. (It is worth reiterating the fact that the term “Latin America” still did not exist and that Alberdi spoke about the future of “American philosophy” as a reflection of the “American people” without meaning to include the philosophy or people of the United States). For Alberdi, Latin American philosophy should be used an intellectual tool for developing an understanding of the most vital social, political, religious, and economic problems facing the people of Latin America. (It is worth nothing that Alberdi’s references to “the people” of Latin America were aimed primarily at his fellow criollos, implicitly excluding the non-white majority of the population). Alberdi’s Foundations and Points of Departure for the Political Organization of the Republic of Argentina served as one of the major foundations for Argentina’s 1853 Constitution, which with amendments remains in force to this day.

c. Positivism

Almost all of the thinkers from the generation that sought intellectual and cultural emancipation from the colonial past came to identify with the philosophy of positivism, which dominated much of the intellectual landscape of Latin America throughout the second half of the nineteenth century. Strictly speaking, positivism originated in Europe with the French philosopher Auguste Comte (1798-1859), but it was warmly welcomed by many Latin American intellectuals who saw Comte’s motto of “order and progress” as a European version of what they had been struggling for themselves. While adapting positivism to their own regional conditions, they presented it optimistically as a philosophy based upon an experimental and scientific method that could modernize both the economy and the educational system in order to produce social and political stability. The influence of positivism on Latin America is perhaps most vividly portrayed in Brazil’s current flag, adopted in 1889, which features the words Ordem e Progresso (Order and Progress). However, the literal adoption of Comte’s motto masks the fact that the meaning of positivism in Latin America underwent considerable change under the influence of the English philosopher Herbert Spencer (1820-1903) and others who both sought to reformulate positivism in light of Darwinian evolutionary theory. This later variety of evolutionary positivism was also frequently called materialism, characterized by its rejection of dualist and idealist metaphysics, its mechanistic philosophy of history, its promotion of intense industrial competition as the primary means of material progress, and its frequent explanation of various social and political problems in biological terms of racial characteristics. While the precise understanding of positivism differed from thinker to thinker and the scope of positivism’s influence varied from country to country, there is little question of its overall importance.

The history of positivism in Mexico can be used to illustrate the shifting meaning of positivism in a particular national context. Gabino Barreda (1818-1881) founded the National Preparatory School in Mexico City in 1868 and made a modified form of Comte’s positivism the basis of its curriculum. Barreda understood Mexico’s social disorder to be a direct reflection of intellectual disorder, which he sought to reorganize in its entirety under the authority of President Benito Juárez. Like Comte, Barreda wanted to place all education in the service of moral, social, and economic progress. Unlike Comte, Barreda interpreted political liberalism as an expression of the positive spirit, modifying Comte’s famous motto to read: “Liberty as the means; order as the base; progress as the end.” The philosophical positions held by the second generation of Mexican positivists were quite different, even though they all hailed Barreda as their teacher. Eventually, many of them joined the científicos, a circle of technocratic advisors to the dictator Porfirio Díaz. The most famous among them, Justo Sierra (1848-1912), developed his philosophy of Mexican history using Spencer’s theory of evolution in an attempt to accelerate the evolution of Mexico through a kind of social engineering. Although Sierra initially judged Porfirio Díaz’s dictatorship to be necessary in order to secure the order necessary to make progress possible, in the final years of his life Sierra cast doubt upon both positivism and the dictatorship it had been used to support.

One of the earliest critics of positivism in Latin America was the Cuban philosopher Jose Martí (1853-1895). His criticism was linked to a different vision of what he called Nuestra América (Our America”), reclaiming the word “America” from the way it is commonly used to refer exclusively to the United States of America. Whereas positivists or materialists tended to explain the evolutionary backwardness of Latin America in terms of the biological backwardness of the races that constituted the majority of its population, Martí pointed to the ongoing international history of political and economic policies that systematically disadvantaged these same people. Like Juan Bautista Alberdi had done a generation before, Martí called for Latin American intellectuals to develop their own understanding of the most vital social, political, religious, and economic problems facing the Latin American people. Unlike Alberdi, Martí took a more positive and inclusive view of Latin American identity by giving indios, mestizos, negros, and mulatos a place alongside criollos in the task of building a truly free Latin America. According to Marti, the ongoing failure of the United States to grant equality to Native Americans and former slaves in the construction of its America was just as dangerous to imitate as the European political model. Unfortunately, Martí died young in the Cuban war to gain political independence from Spain, but as an idealist he believed that powerful ideas like liberty must play an equal role in freeing Latin America from the imperialistic impulses of both Europe and the United States.

4. Twentieth Century

A backlash against the intellectual hegemony of positivism marks the beginning of the twentieth century in Latin America. The “scientific” nature of positivism was charged with being “scientistic;” materialism was challenged by new forms of idealism and vitalism; and evolutionism was criticized by various social and political philosophies that supported revolution. As the century wore on, there was a dramatic proliferation of philosophical currents so that speaking of Latin American philosophy as a whole becomes increasingly difficult. Ironically, this difficulty arises during the very same period that the term “Latin America” first began to achieve widespread use in public and academic discourse, and the period that the first historical treatments of Latin American philosophy appeared. In response to the problems inherent in speaking of Latin American philosophy as a whole, scholars have narrowed their scope by writing about the history of twentieth century philosophy in a particular Latin American country (especially Mexico, Argentina, or Brazil); in a particular region (for example, Central America or the Caribbean); in a particular philosophical tradition (for example, Marxism, phenomenology, existentialism, neo-scholasticism, historicism, philosophy of liberation, analytic philosophy, or feminist philosophy); or in and through a list of important figures. Alternatively, attempts to provide a more panoramic vision of Latin American philosophy in the twentieth century typically proceed by delineating somewhere between three and six generations or periods. For the sake of continuity in scope and detail, the present article utilizes this method and follows a six-generation schema that assigns a rough year to each generation based upon when they were writing rather than when they were born (modeled upon Beorlegui 2006).

a. Generation of 1900: Foundational Critique of Positivism

The members of the first twentieth-century generational group of 1900 are often called “the generation of founders” or “the generation of patriarchs,” following the influential terminology of Francisco Romero or Francisco Miró Quesada, respectively. Members of this generation include José Enrique Rodó (1871-1917) and Carlos Vaz Ferreira (1872-1958) in Uruguay, Alejandro Korn (1860-1936) in Argentina; Alejandro Deústua (1849-1945) in Peru; Raimundo de Farias Brito (1862-1917) in Brazil; Enrique José Varona (1849-1933) in Cuba; and Enrique Molina Garmendia (1871-1964) in Chile. The year of 1900 conveniently refers to the change of century and marks the publication of Rodó’s Ariel, which exerted tremendous influence on other Latin American intellectuals. Like those that had come before them, Rodó and the other members of this generation did not write primarily for other philosophers but rather for a broader public in an attempt to influence the courses of their countries. Like Jose Martí, Rodó criticized a particular form of positivism or materialism, which he associated with the United States or Anglo-Saxon America and presented in the barbaric character of “Caliban” from Shakespeare’s The Tempest. In contrast, Rodó presents the civilized “Ariel” as the Latin American spirit of idealism that values art, sentiment, philosophy, and critical thinking. Rodó thus recommends a return to the classical values of ancient Greece and the best of contemporary European (especially French) philosophy. This recommendation is presented in contrast to what Rodó calls nordomanía or the manic delatinization of America, that is, the growing but unthinking imitation of the United States, its plutocracy, and its reductively material and individualist understandings of success.

b. Generation of 1915: New Philosophical Directions

The members of the generation of 1915 are often grouped with the previous generation of “founders” or “patriarchs” but they are presented here separately because they represent a growing interest in the mestizo or indigenous dimensions of Latin American identity. As it had since colonial times, Latin American philosophy in the twentieth century continued to connect many of its philosophical and political problems to the identity of its peoples. But in light of events like the Mexican revolution that began in 1910, some thinkers began to rebel against the historical tendency to view mestizos and indigenous peoples as negative elements to be overcome through ongoing assimilation and European immigration. Principal members of this generation include Antonio Caso (1883-1946), José Vasconcelos (1882-1959), and Alfonso Reyes (1889-1959) in Mexico; Pedro Henríquez Ureña (1884-1946) in Dominican Republic; Cariolano Alberini (1886-1960) in Argentina; Víctor Raúl Haya de la Torre (1895-1979) and José Carlos Mariátegui (1894-1930) in Peru. The first four thinkers just listed were members of the famous Atheneum of Youth, an intellectual and artistic group founded in 1909 that is crucial for understanding Mexican culture in the twentieth century. Drawing upon Rodó’s Ariel—as well as other American and European philosophers including Henri Bergson (1859–1941), Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900), and William James (1842-1910)—the Atheneum developed a sweeping criticism of the reigning positivism of the científicos and began to take Latin American philosophy in new directions. The members of the Atheneum also explicitly linked their intellectual revolution to Mexico’s social revolution, thereby recapitulating the nineteenth century concern to achieve both political independence and mental emancipation. Jose Vasconcelos’ most famous work, The Cosmic Race (1925), presents a vision of Mexico and Latin America more generally as the birthplace of a new mixed race whose mission would be to usher in a new age by ethnically and spiritually fusing all of the existing races. Vasconcelos subsumed the 1910 Mexican Revolution in a larger world-historical vision of the New World in which Mexicans and other Latin American peoples would redeem humanity from its long history of violence, achieve political stability, and undertake the integral spiritual development of humankind (replacing prevailing notions of human progress as merely materialistic or technological).

Focusing on Indians rather than mestizos, José Carlos Mariátegui offered a vision of Peru and Indo-America (his preferred term for Latin America) that would reverse the disastrous social and economic effects of the conquest. One of the most important Marxist thinkers in the history of Latin America, Mariátegui tied the future of Peru to the socialist liberation of its indigenous peasants, who made up the vast majority of the country’s population and whose lives were only made worse by national independence. Unlike orthodox scientific Marxists, Mariátegui believed that aesthetics and spirituality had a key role to play in fueling the revolution by uniting various marginalized peoples in the belief that they could create a new, more egalitarian society. Furthermore, Mariátegui grounded his analysis in the historical and cultural conditions of the Andean region, which had developed indigenous forms of agrarian communism destroyed by the Spanish colonizers. Seven Interpretive Essays on Peruvian Reality, published in 1928, highlights the Indian character of Peru and offers a structural interpretation of the ongoing exploitation of indigenous peoples as rooted in the usurpation of their communal lands. Mariátegui argued that administrative, educational, and humanitarian approaches to overcoming the suffering of Indians will necessarily fail unless they overcome the local racialized class system that operates in the larger context of global capitalism.

c. Generation of 1930: Forging Latin American Philosophy

The members of the third twentieth-century generational group of 1930 are often called the “forgers” or the “shapers” (depending upon the translation of Miró Quesada’s influential term forjadores). Members include Samuel Ramos (1897-1959) and José Gaos (1900-1969) in Mexico; Francisco Romero (1891-1962) and Carlos Astrada (1894-1970) in Argentina; and Juan David García Bacca (1901-1992) in Venezuela. After the first two generations of “founders” or “patriarchs” had criticized positivism in order to develop their own personal versions of the philosophic enterprise, the forjadores developed the philosophical foundations and institutions that they took to be necessary for bringing their authentically Latin American philosophical projects to the far better-recognized level of European philosophy. Mariátegui can be understood as a precursor in this respect, since his philosophical influences were primarily European, but his philosophy was rooted in a distinctively Peruvian reality. In their quest to philosophize from a distinctively Latin American perspective, many of the forjadores were greatly influenced by the “perspectivism” of the Spanish philosopher José Ortega y Gasset (1883-1955). Ortega’s impact on Latin American philosophy only increased—particularly in Mexico, Argentina, and Venezuela—with the arrival of Spaniards exiled during the Spanish Civil War (1936-1939). José Gaos was undoubtedly the most influential of these transterrados (transplants), who helped found new educational institutions, publish new academic journals, establish new publishing houses, and translate hundreds of works in Ancient and European philosophy.

The long philosophical career of Juan David García Bacca illustrates the shifting philosophical currents and geographic displacements that forged new developments in Latin American philosophy. Author of over five hundred philosophical works and translations, García Bacca received his philosophical training in Spain, largely under the influence of neo-scholasticism until Ortega woke him from his dogmatic slumber. García Bacca spent the first years of his exile (1938-1941) in Quito, Ecuador, where he began to deconstruct the Aristotelian or Thomistic conception of human nature and replace it with an understanding of man as historical, technological, and transfinite. In other words, García Bacca presented human beings as finite creatures who are nevertheless godlike in their infinite capacity to recreate themselves. In 1941, García Bacca accepted an invitation from the National Autonomous University of Mexico (UNAM) to teach a course on the philosophy of the influential German existentialist and phenomenologist Martin Heidegger (1889-1976). In 1946, García Bacca along with other transterrados founded the Department of Philosophy at the Central University of Venezuela, where he continued to work out his philosophy in dialogue with the traditions of historicism, vitalism, phenomenology, hermeneutics, and existentialism. Following a broad intellectual trend in Latin America after the Cuban revolution of 1959, his understanding of the Latin American context was transformed under the influence of Marxism beginning in the 1960s. García Bacca gave his understanding of human nature as transfinite a substantially new twist by requiring nothing less than the transformation of human nature under socialism. Once again indicating broad intellectual trends in the 1980s, García Bacca began distancing himself somewhat from Marxism and contributed greatly to the history of philosophy in Latin America by publishing substantial anthologies of philosophical thought in Venezuela and Colombia. 

d. Generation of 1940: Normalization of Latin American Philosophy

Given the tremendous progress in the institutionalization of Latin American philosophy from roughly 1940 until 1960, this period is frequently referred to as that of “normalization” (again following the influential periodization of Francisco Romero). The generation that benefited was the first to consistently receive formal academic training in philosophy in order to become professors in an established system of universities. These philosophers developed an increasing consciousness of Latin American philosophical identity, aided in part by increased travel and dialogue between Latin American countries and universities (some of it forced under politically oppressive conditions that led to exile). Members of this fourth generation include Risieri Frondizi (1910-1985) and Augusto Salazar Bondy (1925-1974) in Argentina; Miguel Reale (1910-2006) in Brazil; Francisco Miró Quesada (1918- ) in Peru; Arturo Ardao (1912-2003) in Uruguay; and Leopoldo Zea (1912-2004) and Luis Villoro (1922- ) in Mexico. Building upon the philosophies of their teachers, as well as the philosophical conception of hispanidad that many inherited from the Spanish philosophers Miguel de Unamuno (1864-1936) and Ortega y Gasset, this generation developed a critical philosophical perspective that is often called “Latin Americanism.” The philosophy of Leopold Zea is widely taken to be exemplary of this approach. Under the influence of Samuel Ramos and the direction of Jose Gaós at the UNAM, Zea defended his 1944 dissertation on the rise and fall of positivism in Mexico, later translated as Positivism in Mexico (1974). In 1949, Zea founded the famous Hyperion Group of philosophers seeking to shed light upon Mexican identity and reality. Convinced that the past must be known and understood in order to construct an authentic future, Zea went on to situate his work in a panoramic philosophical view of Latin American history, drawing upon the earlier works of Bolívar, Alberdi, Martí, and many others. Zea’s extensive travels and ongoing professional dialogue with other Latin American philosophers across the Continent resulted in many works, including one translated as The Latin American Mind (1963). He also edited a series of works by other scholars on the history of ideas across Latin America, published by El Fondo de Cultura Económica, Mexico’s largest publishing house. Anticipating themes that marked future generations of Latin American philosophy, Zea’s later works such as Latin America and the World (1969) thematized the concepts of marginalization and liberation while situating Latin American philosophy in a global context. In short, Zea consistently sought to develop a Latin American philosophy that would be capable of grasping Latin America’s concrete history and present circumstances in an authentic, responsible, and ultimately universal way.

Zea’s quest for an authentic Latin American philosophy emerged as part of a larger debate over the nature of Latin American philosophy and whether it was something more than an imitation of European philosophy. An examination of one of Zea’s most famous opponents in this debate—Augusto Salazar Bondy—will help set the stage for the subsequent discussion of the philosophies of liberation that emerged in the 1970s with the next philosophical generation. Bondy lays out his position in his book, ¿Existe una filosofía de nuestra América? (1968) [Does a Philosophy of Our America Exist?]. Bondy attacks what he takes to be Zea’s ungrounded idealism and maintains that the existence of an authentic Latin American philosophy is inseparable from the concrete socioeconomic conditions of Latin America, which place it in a situation of dependence and economic underdevelopment in relation to Europe and the United States. This in turn produces a “defective culture” in which inauthentic intellectual works are mistaken for authentic philosophical productions. The problem is not that Latin American philosophy fails to be rooted in concrete reality (a problem that Zea works painstakingly to overcome), but rather that it is concretely rooted in an alienated and divided socioeconomic reality. According to Bondy, the authenticity of Latin American philosophy depends upon the liberation of Latin America from the economic production of its cultural dependence. At the same time, Bondy argues for the inauthenticity of philosophy in Europe and the United States insofar as they depend upon the domination of the Third World. In sum, whereas Zea calls for an authentic philosophical development in Latin America that would critically assimilate the deficiencies of the past, Bondy maintains that liberation from economic domination and cultural dependence is a prerequisite for authentic Latin American philosophy in the future.

Before turning to the next philosophical generation and their philosophies of liberation, it is important to note that there are other major philosophical strands that emerged during the period of normalization (1940-1960). While the period is generally associated with Latin Americanism—which drew upon historicism, existentialism, and phenomenology—other philosophical traditions including Marxism, neo-scholasticism, and analytic philosophy also grew in importance. Important early Latin American analytic philosophers include Vicente Ferreira da Silva (1916-1963) in Brazil, who published work in mathematical logic; Mario Bunge (1919- ) in Argentina and then Canada, who has published extensively in almost all major areas of analytic philosophy; and Héctor-Neri Castañeda (1924-1991) in Guatemala and then the United States, who was a student Wilfrid Sellars (1912-1989) and founded one of the top journals in analytic philosophy, Noûs. Analytic philosophy was further institutionalized in Latin America during the 1960s, especially in Argentina and Mexico, followed by Brazil in the 1970s. In Argentina, Gregorio Kilmovsky (1922-2009) cultivated interest in the philosophy of science, Tomás Moro Simpson (1929- ) did important work in the philosophy of language, and Carlos Alchourrón’s (1931-1996) work on logic and belief revision had an international impact on analytic philosophy and computer science. In Mexico, the Institute of Philosophical Investigations (IIF) and the journal Crítica were both founded in 1967 and continue to serve as focal points for analytic philosophy in Latin America. Notable philosophers at the IIF include Fernando Salmerón (1925-1997), whose major influence was in ethics; Alejandro Rossi (1932-2009), who worked in philosophy of language; and Luis Villoro (1922- ), who works primarily in epistemology and political philosophy. The development of analytic philosophy in Brazil was shaken by the 1964 coup, but resumed in the 1970s. Newton da Costa (1929- ) developed several non-classical logics, most famously paraconsistent logic where certain contradictions are allowed. Oswaldo Chateaubriand (1940- ) has done internationally recognized work in logic, metaphysics, and philosophy of language. Since then, analytic philosophy has continued to grow and develop in Latin America, leading more recently to the 2007 founding of the Asociación Latinoamericana de Filosofía Analítica, whose mission is to promote analytic philosophy through scholarly conferences and other exchanges across Latin America.

e. Generation of 1960: Philosophies of Liberation

After the 1960s, philosophy as a professional academic discipline was well established in Latin America, but it only began to achieve substantial international visibility in the 1970s with the rise of a new generation that developed the philosophy of liberation. The most famous members of this fifth twentieth century generation are from Argentina and include Arturo Andrés Roig (1922-2012), Enrique Dussel (1934- ), and Horacio Cerutti Guldberg (1950- ). The strain of liberation philosophy developed by Ignacio Ellacuría (1930-1989) in El Salvador also stands out as exemplary. In a context marked by violence and political repression, the public philosophical positions of these liberatory thinkers put their lives in jeopardy. Most tragically, Ellacuría was assassinated by a military death squad while chairing the philosophy department of El Salvador’s Universidad Centroamericana. The substantial international impact of the Argentine philosophers of liberation stems in part from their political exile due to the military and state terrorism that characterized the “Dirty War” from 1972-1983. Much like the earlier Spanish transterrados, these philosophers developed and spread their philosophies from their newly adopted countries (Ecuador in the case of Roig, and Mexico in the cases of Dussel and Cerutti Guldberg). Although it should not be confused with the better-known tradition of Latin American liberation theology, Latin American philosophies of liberation emerged from a similar historical and intellectual context that included: a recovery of Latin America’s longstanding preoccupation with political liberation and intellectual independence, the influence of dependency theory in economics, a careful engagement with Marxism, and an emphasis on praxis rooted in an ethical commitment to the liberation of poor or otherwise oppressed groups in the Third World. Yet another parallel strain of Latin American liberationist thought focusing on pedagogy emerged based upon the work of Brazilian philosopher and educator Paulo Freire (1921-1997). Imprisoned and then exiled from Brazil during the military coup of 1964, he developed a vision and method for teaching oppressed peoples (who were often illiterate) how to theorize and practice their own liberation from the dehumanizing socioeconomic conditions that had been imposed upon them. Freire’s book Pedagogy of the Oppressed (1970) drew international attention and became a foundational text in what is now called critical pedagogy.

While Cerutti Guldberg has written the most complete work explaining the intellectual splits that produced different philosophies of liberation—Filosofía de la liberación latinoamericana (2006)—Dussel’s name and work are most widely known given his tremendous efforts to promote the philosophy of liberation through dialogue with famous European philosophers including Karl-Otto Apel (1922- ) and Jurgen Habermas (1929) as well as famous North American philosophers including Richard Rorty (1931-2007) and Charles Taylor (1931- ). By analyzing the relationship between Latin American cultural-intellectual dependence and socioeconomic oppression, Dussel seeks to develop transformational conceptions and practices leading to liberation from both of these conditions. Dussel argues that the progress of European philosophy through the centuries has come at the expense of the vast majority of humanity, whose massive poverty has only rarely appeared as a fundamental philosophical theme. Dussel’s best-known early work Philosophy of Liberation (1980) attempts to foreground, diagnose, and transform the oppressive socioeconomic and intellectual systems that are largely controlled by European and North American interests and power groups at the expense of Third World regions including Latin America. Instead of only pretending to be universal, at the expense of most people who are largely ignored, historical and philosophical progress must be rooted in a global dialogue committed to recognizing and listening to the least heard on their own terms. Influenced by the French philosopher Immanuel Levinas (1906-1995), Dussel highlights the importance of this ethical method, which he calls analectical to contrast it with the totalizing tendencies of the Hegelian dialectic. A prolific author of more than fifty books, Dussel’s later work attempts to systematically develop philosophical principles for a critical ethics of liberation alongside a critical politics of liberation. Dussel’s 1998 book, Ethics of Liberation in the Age of Globalization and Exclusion (translated in 2013), is often cited as an important later work.

While not typically categorized as part of the philosophy of liberation in the narrow sense, Latin American feminist philosophy is an important but typically under-recognized form of emancipatory thought that has existed in academic form for at least a century. In 1914, Carlos Vaz Ferreira (1872-1958) began publicly analyzing and discussing the importance of civil and political rights for women, as well as women’s access to education and professional careers. Vaz Ferreira’s feminist philosophy was published as Sobre feminismo in 1933, the same year that woman gained the right to vote in Uruguay. Given that Vaz Ferreira belongs to the first twentieth century generation of the “patriarchs” of Latin American philosophy, it is worth emphasizing that women were systematically marginalized from the academic discipline of philosophy until much later in the twentieth century, when the feminist movements of the 1970s led to the institutionalization of Women’s Studies or Gender Studies in Latin American universities in the 1980s and 1990s. An important connecting tissue for these movements has been the Encuentros Feminista Latinoamericano y del Caribe, an ongoing series of biennial (later triennial) meetings of Latin American women and feminist activists, first held in 1981 in Bogotá, Colombia. While the diversity that characterizes feminism makes it problematic to make generalized comparisons between Latin American feminism and feminism in Europe and the United States, Latin American feminists have tended to be more concerned with the context of family life and to giving equal importance to ethnicity and class as categories of analysis (Femenías and Oliver 2007). 

One of the earliest and most influential Latin American feminist philosophers was Graciela Hierro (1928-2003), who introduced feminist philosophy into the academic curriculum of the UNAM beginning in the 1970s and organized the first panel on feminism at a national Mexican philosophy conference in 1979. Hierro is best remembered for the feminist ethics of pleasure that she developed beginning with her book Ética y feminismo (1985). Criticizing the “double sexual morality” that assigns asymmetrical moral roles based upon gender, Hierro argues for a hedonistic sexual ethic rooted in a love of self that makes prudence, solidarity, justice, and equity possible. The rise of feminist philosophy alongside other feminist social and intellectual movements in Latin America has also led to the recovery and popularization of writings by marginalized women thinkers, including the work of Sor Juana de la Cruz (1651-1695) discussed above. Another important intellectual resource has been the development of oral history projects or testimonios that seek to document the lives and ideas of countless women living in poverty or obscurity. One of the most famous books in this genre is I, Rigoberta Menchú (1983), the testimonial autobiography of a Quiche Mayan woman, Rigoberta Menchú Tum (1959- ), who began fighting for the rights of women and indigenous people in Guatemala as a teenager and went on to win a Nobel Peace Prize in 1992.

f. Generation of 1980: Globalization, Postmodernism, and Postcolonialism

The sixth and last generation of twentieth century Latin American philosophers emerged in the 1980s. While speaking of broad trends is always somewhat misleading given the diversity of approaches and interests, one interesting trend lies in how Latin American philosophers from this generation have contributed to the analysis and criticism of globalization by participating in new intellectual debates concerning postmodernism in the 1980s and postcolonialism in the 1990s. For example, some new philosophers of liberation like Raul Fornet-Betancourt (1946- ) sought to revise fundamental theoretical dichotomies such as center/periphery, domination/liberation, and First World/Third World that were critical in terms of their general thrust but insufficiently nuanced in light of the complex phenomena that go by the name of globalization. Fornet-Betancourt’s own biography points to this complexity, since he was born in Cuba but moved to Germany in 1972, earning his college degree and first PhD in philosophy in Spain, then returning to complete a second PhD in theology and linguistics in Germany, where he is currently a professor who publishes extensively in both German and Spanish. Self-critical of much of his own philosophical training and development, Fornet-Betancourt has rooted himself in Latin American philosophy in order to devise an intercultural approach to understanding philosophy in light of the diverse histories and cultures that have produced human wisdom across time and space. In contrast to globalization, which is a function of a global political economy that does not tolerate differences or alternatives to a global monoculture of capitalism and consumption, Fornet-Betancourt outlines the economic and political conditions that would make genuinely symmetrical intercultural dialogue and exchange possible.

Drawing critically upon discussions of globalization and postmodernism, the discourse of postcolonialism emerged in the final decade of the twentieth century. The basic idea is that globalization has produced a new transnational system of economic colonialism that is distinct from but related to the national and international forms of colonialism that characterized the world between the conquest of America and the Second World War. Among other things, postcolonialism addresses the politics of knowledge in globalized world that is unified by complex webs of exclusion based upon gender, class, race, ethnicity, language, and sexuality. One of the fundamental criticisms leveled by postcolonialism is the way that neo-colonial discourses routinely and violently construct homogeneous wholes like “The Third World” or “Latin America” out of heterogeneous peoples, places, and their cultures. Like postmodernism, postcolonial theory did not initially come from or focus on Latin America, so there is considerable debate about whether or how postcolonial theory should be developed in a Latin American context. A variant of this debate has occurred among Latin American feminists who do not generally view themselves as part of postcolonial feminism, which has been charged with overlooking tremendous differences between the former English and French colonies and the former Spanish and Portuguese colonies (Schutte and Femenías 2010). One of the best-known Latin American thinkers who works critically in conjunction with postcolonial studies is Walter Mignolo (1941- ). He was born in Argentina, where he completed his B.A. in philosophy before moving to Paris to obtain his Ph.D., eventually becoming a professor in the United States. Rather than apply foreign postcolonial theory to the Latin American context, Mignolo has mined the history of Latin America for authors who found ways to challenge or subversively employ the rules of colonial discourse, for example, the native Andean intellectual and artist Felipe Guamán Poma de Ayala (c.1550-1616) discussed above. Mignolo’s book, The Idea of Latin America (2005), excavates the history of how the idea of Latin America came about in order to show how it still rests upon colonial foundations that must be transformed by decolonial theory and practice.

5. Twenty-First Century

a. Plurality of Philosophies in Latin America

In the early twenty-first century, Latin America became home to the ongoing development and institutionalization of many philosophical traditions and approaches including analytic philosophy, Latin Americanism, phenomenology, existentialism, hermeneutics, Marxism, neo-scholasticism, feminism, history of philosophy, philosophy of liberation, postmodernism, and postcolonialism. At the same time, the very idea of Latin America has been posed as a major problem (Mignolo 2005), following historically in the wake of the still unresolved controversy over how philosophy itself should be understood. While the dominant philosophical currents and trends differ both across and within various Latin American countries and regions, all of the major philosophical approaches that predominate in Europe and the United States are well-represented.

b. Normalization of Latin American Philosophy in the United States

The term “Latin American philosophy” has also gained widespread use and attracted considerable research interest in the United States. This is due in large measure to the efforts of a generation of Latino and Latina philosophers who were born in Latin America and went on to become professors in the United States where they teach and publish in better-established philosophical fields as well as in Latin American philosophy. These philosophers include Walter Mignolo (1941- ), María Lugones (1948- ), and Susana Nuccetelli (1954-) from Argentina; Jorge J. E. Gracia (1942- ) and Ofelia Schutte (1945- ) from Cuba; Linda Martín Alcoff (1955- ) from Panama; and Eduardo Mendieta (1963- ) from Colombia. Their philosophical interests and approaches to Latin American philosophy vary greatly and include postcolonial theory, feminism, metaphysics, epistemology, critical philosophy of race, philosophy of liberation, philosophy of language, metaphilosophy, continental philosophy, and critical theory. This generation has also made important contributions to the analysis of, and debate over, Hispanic or Latino/a identity in the United States, especially as it intersects with other complex dimensions of identity including race, ethnicity, nationality, class, language, gender, and sexual orientation.

Borrowing a term from the history of Latin American philosophy, we may eventually be able to speak of the early twenty-first century as the period of normalization for Latin American philosophy in the United States. Given the accomplishments of the generation of mostly Latino and Latina founders, a few philosophy graduate students in the United States have been the first presented with opportunities to receive some formal training in Latin American philosophy and to make it a major part of their research agenda early in their careers. Moreover, the first handful of job listings at universities in the United States have emerged calling for professors who specialize in Latin American philosophy. The early twenty-first century has also been marked by an increasing number of English-language articles and books on Latin American philosophy. Nevertheless, if this trend toward more development of Latin American philosophy is to continue, then large hurdles remain, including a major shortage of primary Latin American philosophical texts available in English translation, a widespread lack of knowledge concerning Latin American philosophy among most professional philosophers in the United States, and the resulting need for most U.S. philosophers interested in Latin American philosophy to maintain an active research agenda and publication record in at least one better-recognized philosophical area or field.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alberdi, Juan Bautista. “Foundations and Points of Departure for the Political Organization of the Republic of Argentina.” Translated by Janet Burke and Ted Humphrey. In Nineteenth-Century Nation Building and the Latin American Intellectual Tradition: A Reader. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2007.
  • Alcoff, Linda Martín. Visible Identities: Race, Gender, and the Self. New York: Oxford University Press, 2006.
  • Arciniegas, Germán. Latin America: A Cultural History. Translated by Joan MacLean. New York: Knopf, 1966.
  • Beorlegui, Carlos. Historia del pensamiento filosofico latinoamericano: una busqueda incesante de la identidad. Bilbao: Universidad de Deusto, 2006.
  • Beorlegui, Carlos . “La Filosofía de Jd García Bacca.” Isegoría, no. 7 (1993): 151-64.
  • Bolívar, Simón. El Libertador: Writings of Simón Bolívar. Translated by Frederick H. Fornoff. Edited by David Bushnell. New York: Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Bondy, Augusto Salazar. ¿Existe una filosofía de nuestra américa? México: Siglo XXI, 1968.
  • Burke, Janet, and Ted Humphrey, eds. Nineteenth-Century Nation Building and the Latin American Intellectual Tradition: A Reader. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2007.
  • Cerutti Guldberg, Horacio. Filosofía de la liberación latinoamericana. México: Fondo de Cultura Económica, 2006.
  • Chasteen, John Charles. Born in Blood & Fire: A Concise History of Latin America. New York: W. W. Norton & Company, 2011.
  • Costa, João Cruz. A History of Ideas in Brazil: The Development of Philosophy in Brazil and the Evolution of National History. Translated by Suzette Macedo. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1964.
  • Crawford, William Rex. A Century of Latin-American Thought. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1961.
  • de la Cruz, Sor Juana Inés. The Answer / La Respuesta. Edited and Translated by Electa Arenal and Amanda Powell. New York: Feminist Press at the City University of New York, 2009.
  • de las Casas, Bartolomé. In Defense of the Indians. Translated by Stafford Poole. DeKalb: Northern Illinois University Press, 1992.
  • Dussel, Enrique. Ethics of Liberation: In the Age of Globalization and Exclusion. Translated by Alejandro A. Vallega and Eduardo Mendieta. Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 2013.
  • Dussel, Enrique . Philosophy of Liberation. Translated by Aquilina Martinez and Christine Morkovsky. Eugene, OR: Wipf & Stock Publishers, 1980.
  • Dussel, Enrique . Politics of Liberation: A Critical Global History. Translated by Thia Cooper. Canterbury: SCM Press, 2011.
  • Dussel, Enrique, Eduardo Mendieta, and Carmen Bohórquez, eds. El pensamiento filosofico latinoamericano, del Caribe y “latino” (1300-2000): historia, corrientes, temas y filósofos. México: Siglo XXI, 2009.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio. Ignacio Ellacuria: Essays on History, Liberation, and Salvation. Edited by Michael E. Lee. Maryknoll, NY: Orbis Books, 2013.
  • Femenías, María Luisa, and Amy A. Oliver, eds. Feminist Philosophy in Latin America and Spain. New York: Rodopi, 2007.
  • Fornet-Betancourt, Raúl. Transformación intercultural de la filosofía: ejercicios teóricos y prácticos de filosofía intercultural desde latinoamérica en el contexto de la globalización. Bilbao: Desclée de Brouwer, 2001.
  • Freire, Paulo. Pedagogy of the Oppressed. Translated by Myra Bergman Ramos. New York: Herder and Herder, 1970.
  • García Bacca, Juan David. Antología del pensamiento filosófico venezolano. Caracas: Ediciones del Ministerio de Educación, 1954.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E. Hispanic / Latino Identity: A Philosophical Perspective. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 1999.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E., ed. Latin American Philosophy Today. A Special Double Issue of The Philosophical Forum. Vol. 20:1-2, 1988-89.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E.. Philosophical Analysis in Latin America. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1984.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E., and Elizabeth Millán-Zaibert. Latin American Philosophy for the 21st Century: The Human Condition, Values, and the Search for Identity. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 2004.
  • Guaman Poma de Ayala, Felipe The First New Chronicle and Good Government [Abridged]. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 2006.
  • Hierro, Graciela. Ética y feminismo. México: Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México, 1985.
  • Hierro, Graciela . La ética del placer. México: Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México, 2001.
  • Ivan, Marquez, ed. Contemporary Latin American Social and Political Thought: An Anthology. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 2008.
  • Mariátegui, José Carlos. Seven Interpretive Essays on Peruvian Reality. Translated by Marjory Urquidi. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1971.
  • Martí, José. José Martí Reader: Writings on the Americas. Edited by Deborah Scnookal and Mirta Muñiz. Melbourne: Ocean Press, 2007.
  • Mendieta, Eduardo, ed. Latin American Philosophy: Currents, Issues, Debates. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2003.
  • Mignolo, Walter D. The Darker Side of the Renaissance: Literacy, Territoriality, and Colonization. Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 1995.
  • Mignolo, Walter D . The Idea of Latin America. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2005.
  • Moraña, Mabel, Enrique Dussel, and Carlos A. Jáuregui, eds. Coloniality at Large: Latin America and the Postcolonial Debate. Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 2008.
  • Nuccetelli, Susana, Ofelia Schutte, and Otávio Bueno, eds. A Companion to Latin American Philosophy. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2010.
  • Nuccetelli, Susana, and Gary Seay. Latin American Philosophy: An Introduction with Readings. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson, 2003.
  • Nuccetelli, Susanna. Latin American Thought: Philosophical Problems and Arguments. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 2002.
  • Portilla, Miguel León. Aztec Thought and Culture: A Study of the Ancient Nahuatl Mind. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1963.
  • Rodó, José Enrique. Ariel. Translated by Margaret Sayers Peden. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1988.
  • Salles, Arleen, and Elizabeth Millán-Zaibert. The Role of History in Latin American Philosophy: Contemporary Perspectives. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2006.
  • Sánchez Reulet, Aníbal. Contemporary Latin American Philosophy: A Selection with Introduction and Notes. Translated by Willard R. Trask. Albuquerque: The University of New Mexico Press, 1954.
  • Schutte, Ofelia. Cultural Identity and Social Liberation in Latin American Thought. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1993.
  • Schutte, Ofelia, and María Luisa Femenías. “Feminist Philosophy.” In A Companion to Latin American Philosophy, edited by Susana Nuccetelli, Ofelia Schutte and Otávio Bueno. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2010.
  • Sierra, Justo. The Political Evolution of the Mexican People. Translated by Charles Ramsdell. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1976.
  • Vasconcelos, José. The Cosmic Race: A Bilingual Edition. Translated by Didier T. Jaén. Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997.
  • Vaz Ferreira, Carlos. Sobre feminismo. Buenos Aires: Editorial Losada, 1945.
  • Zea, Leopoldo. The Latin-American Mind. Translated by James H. Abbott and Lowell Dunham. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1963.
  • Zea, Leopoldo . Latin America and the World. Translated by Beatrice Berler and Frances Kellam Hendricks. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1969.
  • Zea, Leopoldo . Positivism in Mexico. Translated by Josephine H. Schulte. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1974.
  • Zea, Leopoldo . The Role of the Americas in History. Translated by Sonja Karsen. Edited by Amy A. Oliver. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 1991.


Author Information

Alexander V. Stehn
University of Texas-Rio Grande Valley
U. S. A.

Molyneux’s Question

William MolyneuxMolyneux’s question, also known as Molyneux’s problem, concerns the possibility that a person born blind might immediately identify a shape previously familiar to them only by touch if they were made to see. Through personal correspondence, William Molyneux initially presented this query to John Locke in 1688. Locke then interposed the question within the Second edition of his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding:

"Suppose a Man born blind, and now adult, and taught by his touch to distinguish between a Cube, and a Sphere of the same metal, and nighly of the same bigness, so as to tell, when he felt one and t’other, which is the Cube, which the Sphere.  Suppose then the Cube and Sphere placed on a Table, and the Blind Man to be made to see.  Quære, Whether by his sight, before he touched them, he could now distinguish, and tell, which is the Globe, which the Cube (Locke 1694/1979)."

Molyneux’s question soon became a fulcrum for early research in the epistemology of concepts, challenging common nativist intuitions about concept acquisition; asking whether sensory features distinguish concepts and how concepts may be applied in novel experiences. The question was reprinted and discussed by a wide range of early modern philosophers, including Gottfried Leibniz, George Berkeley, and Adam Smith, and was perhaps the most important problem in the burgeoning discipline of psychology of the 18th century.

The question has since undergone various stages of development, both as a mental exercise and as an experimental paradigm, garnering a variety of both affirmative and negative replies during three centuries of debate and deliberation. A renewed interest has been sparked by very recent empirical work on subjects recently healed of cataracts who failed to identify the shapes at first sight, but were soon re-tested with successful results.

Should we answer Molyneux’s question with a “no,” as was the common response of the 18th century, or “yes,” as some philosophers today claim? How should the success of these answers be decided? Is the question theoretical or empirical? Can the question be sufficiently answered by science? What is its philosophical importance?

Table of Contents

  1. A Complex of Questions
  2. Negative Replies
  3. Affirmative Replies
  4. Development as a Thought Experiment
  5. Development as an Empirical Problem
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. A Complex of Questions

Molyneux’s question prompts a number of perplexing issues in both the psychology and philosophy of perception. It links these fields of study with a variety of questions:

  • Does sensory experience individuate the senses?
  • Does sensory experience individuate sensory concepts?
  • Are sensory-specific concepts, if there are such, accessible to conscious reflection or perceptual learning as to make them immediately usable for recognition tasks by other senses?
  • Is our sensory knowledge of the external world indirect?

The first two of these questions represent a central consideration for answering Molyneux’s question with a “no.” In the traditional view, which is much less prominent today (see Macpherson 2011), sensory experience is the principal basis for individuating both the senses and concepts. Berkeley (1709), for instance, held to the strongest form of sensory individuation: the senses are metaphysically distinct, some being portals to spatial dimensions (touch) and others non-spatial (vision). In consequence, he infamously defended a metaphysical individuation or heterogeneity between concepts acquired from different senses. A concept of a seen line and a touched line do not together constitute a longer perceived line, existing on distinct axes of existence.

Others embraced a weak epistemological difference between the senses, and hence between sensory concepts; in this view, translation of their content is possible but learning their common meaning requires rational thought (Leibniz) or time and experience (Locke). Just as rational exertion or time and experience are needed to train the use of one sense—one must “teach” one's own sight to see 3-D figures when viewing “3-D Magic Eye” photos, for instance—visually presented shapes require a degree of perceptual training before they can be recognized correctly as those previously touched. Others held to a stronger distinction between sensory formats, claiming that they are too incompatible to be translated, though the same “meaning” is shared between them, offering a strong epistemological difference between sensory concepts (Lotze). At best, such concepts become correlated, but are never known to correspond to the same objects.

If concepts are heterogeneous (weakly, strongly, or metaphysically), then direct knowledge of objects in the external world is problematic. For instance, if our knowledge of a tomato is acquired from vision and later from touch, then these two different presentations of a tomato might amount to two different concepts of tomato altogether, not to mention the soon-to-be smelled and tasted tomato. This invites the possibility that our knowledge of the external world is indirect, being affected by the peculiarities of our sensory organs and processing mechanisms. By contrast, others have argued that because we have direct knowledge of only one tomato, any phenomenal difference between the senses is circumstantial, like an accent rather than a distinct language, a view defended by John Campbell (1996).

The issues prompted by Molyneux’s question lead to a complex of answers in response. Answers can be neatly (perhaps too neatly) categorized into “no” and “yes,” but they are negations and affirmations of different questions, determined by the basis on which these answers are given. Hence, we find some philosophers answering “yes” for one reason, “no” for another, others claiming that there is no possible answer, and yet others claiming that a plurality of answers is agreeable. In addition, a number of purposed modifications, both empirical and theoretical, further attempt to isolate specific queries within the general question. Given its complexity, we should judge the success of Molyneux’s question based not on its answerability but on its productivity.

2. Negative Replies

The two central reasons for answering Molyneux’s question “no” concern the heterogeneous nature of concepts, either as metaphysically or epistemologically distinct, and the involvement of perceptual learning—the inferring of connections in otherwise disparate sensory representations, involving one or multiple senses. Though these reasons are interrelated, as perceptual learning presumes heterogeneity, they are differentiated by emphasis of the philosopher. These views have evolved in various ways, as new empirical discoveries suggest that unconscious neurological learning processes should be considered separately from conscious “conceptual” processes. The diagram below provides a map of these negative replies.


Molyneux himself stressed the issue of perceptual learning, replying that the felt corner of a cube would not at first appear to the eye in the same way as the seen corner of the cube. Time and experience are the means for acquiring knowledge of the associations between seen and felt properties of shape. Locke agreed to Molyneux’s negative reply, but based on his own reasoning on perceptual learning within the sense of sight alone, claiming that sight initially produces primitive sensations later altered by practice; the first appearance of a sphere is as a “circle variously colored” but is judged after time and experience to be a sphere singularly colored. Those considering Locke’s reply have observed that this description of first sight is pure conjecture, as Locke had no access to his own memory of first sight. Others have argued that were two-dimensional shapes presented to the once-blind, Locke would have replied to Molyneux’s question in the affirmative. But, Locke’s example may (like Berkeley) express the idea that the primitive visual sensations of a sphere are non-spatial altogether, and thus a two-dimensional shape would not help the once-blind identify the shapes.

The question of first sight and perceptual learning, however, has become an empirical issue of late. Current research on neural plasticity, or how adept our brains are at changing in response to novel information, informs Shaun Gallagher’s negative reply. He considers the numerous reports of subjects who fail to recognize shapes after their cataracts are removed, and attributes their recognitional inability to the significant deterioration of their visual cortex. Gallager’s reply is based on a degenerative case of perceptual learning within the visual sense; with disuse the faculty of vision “unlearns” its ability to see. By way of contrast, Marjolein Degenaar argues from this same set of data that cataract surgeries show Molyneux’s question not to be testable; she concludes that there is “no answer” to Molyneux’s question. She follows Julien Offray de La Mettrie who contests the applicability of the cataract operations to Molyneux’s question because of the physiological distress involved, but Degenaar adds that no other experimental paradigm will better suited to testing Molyneux’s question.

Perceptual learning, however, is ineffective if sensory formats are thought to be completely distinct. Berkeley’s argument for the heterogeneity of the senses was based on observations that vision is a non-spatial sense: retinal images are inverted, double images can be generated from two eyes, and distance is inaccessible to sight. Sight depends on correlations with touch so that the body can use sight to interact with spatial features of objects. (Followers of this thought, such as Comte de Buffon, misread these ideas as entailing that infants and the once-blind initially see the world as inverted, doubled, and without distance. Because of this, the basis of Buffon’s own negative reply falls to the “psychologist’s fallacy” that we actually see our retinal images, images known only by an anatomy lesson.)

Consideration of the non-spatiality of the sensations produced by the senses at first sight led Étienne Bonnet de Condillac to retract an earlier affirmative reply. He based his newfound intuition on imagining himself as an eyeless statue, confined to mere tactile knowledge of objects, only able to understand the size, distance, and orientation of objects at a distance by use of rigid sticks that, when crossed like a drafting compass, provided him with the information to calculate their true size/distance ratios. Postulating that sight alone would independently produce the same knowledge (by rays of light replacing the tactile sticks to calculate the size, distance, and shape of objects around him), he could account for common meaning between the senses. With his emphasis on the heterogeneity of the senses, Condillac claimed that the once-blind would be entirely confused by the initial visual appearance of color patch sensations. In 1887, Hermann Lotze argued that all sensations are non-spatial, but soon are correlated with learned “local signs”—representations of behavioral interactions with the spatial features of the external world. Lotze maintained that it takes much time and effort to learn to perceive a spatial world. Since the blind perceive space by touch alone, which is a very different mode than sight, the local signs of the once-blind would be inapplicable to both the new visual sensations and the local signs that they would later produce, leading him to conclude a negative reply to Molyneux’s question.

3. Affirmative Replies

The viability of an affirmative reply to Molyneux’s question is a recent development, spurred largely by a mix of supportive studies in developmental science and neuroscience, and the increased popularity of direct realism in epistemology. Some philosophers are on record as answering on nativist grounds, that either an inborn spatial schemata is required for integrated sensory perception or that inborn mechanisms are necessary for matching otherwise heterogeneous concepts. Common sensibles, representations that are not tied to any sensory format, also ground an important response strategy, but vary with respect to the kind of commonality achieved─whether common concepts of shape properties, common behavioral responses to shapes, or common concepts of shapes. Finally, the use of geometry is viewed as crucial to how the once-blind reason, and directly perceive the external world. These categories of reply are presented below in the diagram.


Though Immanuel Kant himself never explicitly considered Molyneux’s question in writing, his contemporaries considered the question an important test for Kant’s theory that a unified spatial organization is a prerequisite for having any perceptual experience. It seems at first that Kant’s view predicts that the visual perception of the once-blind is ordered in the same way as their tactile perception of the shapes—that is, that both experiences employ the same spatial concepts. Kant’s contemporaries' speculation of an affirmative reply, however, fails to consider that further time and experience might be required to coordinate the unification of visual and tactile perception. For more discussion, see the work of Sassen (2004).

Rather than employing a conceptual commonality, Adam Smith argued in his essay “On the External Senses” that inborn mechanisms automatically generate correlations between touch and the other senses. Like the rules of perspective that visual artists employ to render depth in paintings, this mechanism must utilize innately known rules for purposes of recognition, a mechanism Smith called “instinctive suggestion.” In a similar vein, Jesse Prinz argued that innately synchronized processing of heterogeneous visual and tactile content creates “convergence zones,” areas that bind input from multiple sensory specific cortexes and project the bound input back to these processors in recall tasks such that each sense-specific representation gets activated at the same time.

Not all philosophers view the heterogeneity of the senses as entailing a heterogeneous conceptual repertoire. Edward Synge, an acquaintance of Molynuex, presented his own affirmative reply, which hinged on distinguishing between “images” which are heterogeneous in the mind and “notions” or “ideas” which allow those at first sight to cognize common features in the tactile and visual images, such as the smooth surface of the sphere and the cornered appearance of the cube. Judith Jarvis Thompson imagines a similar answer, but her argument involves an indirect strategy; she argues that, metaphysically, there is no possible world in which the properties of felt cubes would appear to sight as the properties of spheres, a possibility she took to be entailed by a negative answer, all things being equal.

Gareth Evans’ influential paper of 1985 considered the proposal that the commonality between seeing and touching shapes had to be an ability to egocentrically localize the parts of shape—to know where the parts of a shape are with respect to the subject’s locus of action. In other words, for Evans we perceive shape by where we find parts of shapes to be in egocentric space. To perceive a square, for instance, there must be an internal representation of a corner that is felt “to the right” and then along the edge “to the left,” another corner felt “down,” and then another “to the right.” Our perception of a felt square must be based on the same egocentric relations gained from perception of the seen square. Since the same egocentric relations must be used, our perception of the square is the same for touch and sight. This intuition provides a behavioral basis for an affirmative answer to Molyneux’s question, one which Alva Noë takes as a test case for his enactivist account of perception: the claim that we perceive with our bodily activity, not with our brain.

Francis Hutcheson’s affirmative reply in 1727 to Molyneux’s question was based on the existence of homogeneous shape concepts that are unconnected to the senses by which they are acquired. Shapes can be perceptually characterized in a number of ways, such as bounded colors or collections of textures. However, shape concepts are themselves distinct from these sensory representations. Hutcheson demonstrated this intuition with a set of creative (though by no means persuasive) thought experiments: would a blind, paralytic (and presumably deaf) man, whose sense of reality is based on smell, understand number and its application in geometrical reasoning? Would a blind man unacquainted with the feel of a stringed instrument be able to derive its musical scale upon only hearing its sounds? Hutcheson’s intuitions suggested a “yes” answer to both of these scenarios, and by extension, an affirmative reply to Molyneux’s question.

Like Synge, Leibniz argued for a distinction between images and ideas, claiming that the latter are homogeneous across the senses because of their geometrical content. The importance of rational thought is emphasized by Leibniz’s modifications that the newly sighted be told the names of the shapes presented to them and be acquainted with their new visual experiences so as to be able to apply geometrical inferences to them.

Thomas Reid agreed with Locke that at first sight, shapes would look flat, appearing like a painting lacking perspective. This led him to claim that the once-blind could immediately recognize two-dimensional shapes. If, however, the shapes of seen objects have volume—are three-dimensional—they would look different from how they felt, and would be unrecognizable. But since these differences can be represented geometrically, a blind mathematician would be able to calculate which visible shapes correlate with which tactile shapes. For more discussion, see (Van Cleve, 2007).

John Campbell argued that since our senses achieve a direct relationship to the external world, sensory experience must parallel external features rather than those of particular sense modalities. In particular, the geometrical properties of objects constitute one’s sensory experience. This guarantees that the perception of shape by sight and touch will be uniform in structure because perception provides one with a direct, unmediated relationship to objects in the world. If the external object itself provides the character of the experience, then experiences of objects by sight and touch must have the same character, resulting in the once-blind’s immediate recognition of the shapes at first sight.

John Campbell argued that since our senses achieve a direct relationship to the external world, sensory experience must parallel external features rather than those of particular sense modalities. In particular, the geometrical properties of objects constitute one’s sensory experience. This guarantees that the perception of shape by sight and touch will be uniform in structure because perception provides one with a direct relationship to objects in the world with no mediation. If the external object itself provides the character of the experience, then experiences of objects by sight and touch must have the same character, resulting in the once-blind’s immediate recognition of the shapes at first sight.

4. Development as a Thought Experiment

The diversity of answers to Molyneux’s question further indicates a lack of specificity and the need to carefully articulate precise issues of interest within the question itself. This pressure has thus provoked a number of philosophers to retool the question and control variables in an attempt to isolate specific issues. These developments can be organized around changes made to three crucial features of the experiment: simplifying the three-dimensional shape stimuli, stipulating aspects of the subject engaged in the task, and modifying the experimental procedure.

Furthermore, this focused treatment follows the more traditional view that Molyneux’s question is a thought experiment, though many philosophers invoke experimental paradigms for inclusion into the query being posed. These developments are represented in the diagram below.


Denis Diderot argued in 1749 that if the stimulus shapes were simplified from three-dimensional cubes and spheres to two-dimensional squares and circles, an affirmative answer would not require accounting for Locke’s preoccupation with perceptual learning within the sense of sight. Gareth Evans suggested a further simplification to account for the possibility that the organs of sight might themselves remain ineffective: the once-blind subject may view four internal visual points (phosphenes) configured in a square shape generated by direct neural stimulation of the visual cortex. Evans’ development has generated an entirely new approach to the problem of making Molyneux’s question amenable to empirical experimentation, one that has produced results that are favorable (though not conclusive) to his affirmative reply.

James Van Cleve developed a less invasive strategy for testing the once-blind. He suggested using a single raised Braille dot in proximity to a pair of raised dots for visual presentation to the once-blind, who should then be able to immediately identify which is the single and which the paired dots. This strategy of simplifying shapes, however, comes at the cost of decreasing the amount of available information for recognizing the shapes, increasing the ambiguity of which shape is being represented for the subject. This is a problem that future modifications may address.

Subject Stipulation
Given the ambiguity problem of simplifying shapes, it may seem ironic that Diderot also took the level of intellectual aptitude of the subject to be determinative of recognitional ability. A “dullard”—presumably a subject with cognitive disabilities—would not identify two-dimensional shapes, whereas subjects with normal cognitive ability would, though they would lack reasons for how and would be generally uncertain of their visual judgment. By contrast, a “metaphysician” trained in philosophy would recognize the shapes with certainty but would be unable to articulate common features of the seen and touched shapes. A “geometer” would not only have certainty in his identification but also knowledge of the geometrical features common to sight and touch. Thomas Reid took kindly to this latter stipulation, and in 1764 added detail that included the precise mathematical strategies the geometer might employ.

Physical constraints have also been suggested for Molyneux’s hypothetical subject. Condillac’s “statue” modification required that when considering Molyneux’s question, individual sense modalities should be deployed one at a time without considering those of previous or future experience. This helped express Condillac’s intuition that each mode of sensation contributes to one’s sense of the spatiality of the external world, though the sensations of each sense are entirely distinct. H. P. Grice, by contrast, imagined sensory organs entirely alien to humans; by describing the unique experiences of color-type properties that these organs would produce, he was able to demonstrate just how unfamiliar colors are to the blind, and thereby the distinctiveness of experience for the once-blind at first sight.

Gallagher’s concern with the neurophysiological differences between the once-blind and always-sighted led him to suggest a hypothetical Molyneux subject with no neural degeneration from their blindness so as to compensate for a central variable: all visually deprived subjects face neural deterioration of visual processing centers. Such a subject would be similar to an infant, another subject suggested for inclusion by Gallagher and anticipated by Adam Smith, but distinct in that infants’ neural organization would be primed for sensory integration whereas the hypothetical subject would be neutral in this regard.

Procedural Modification
Though developments to the stimuli and subjects directly influence how the test itself proceeds, independent procedural developments are worth noting for their ability to constrain features left ambiguous by Molyneux’s own rendering of the question. Six years prior to the publication of his famous question, Molyneux raised a related query, “Whether he Could know by his sight, before he stretchd out his Hand, whether he Could not Reach them, tho they were Removed 20 or 1000 feet from him?” (Locke 1688/1978). Molyneux presumably would have also answered the distance variant of his question negatively. More importantly, this helps to qualify Molyneux’s popularized question to indicate that the presentation of shapes is proximate to the subject. Another implicit feature of the question was expressed by Leibniz, who stipulated that the once-blind should be told the names of the shapes being presented for recognition. This gives the subject a hint, so that recognizing the shapes is merely a matter of determining which shape was which, and also indicates that the stimuli are not simply paintings, but real bodies accessible to touch.

Leibniz also added an epistemic condition that the once-blind be allowed a familiarity of the experience of sight and an inferential ability on par with the normally sighted. These additional constraints would prevent circumstantial factors from affecting the test; the once-blind would not be “dazzled and confused by the strangenesss” of seeing. A further constraint by van Cleve emphasized this worry by advocating that that the primary stimuli be the visual appearances of the shapes rather than the presented shapes themselves. This condition controls for the possibility that the processing of visual information is systematically distorted such that to the once-blind, shape corners appear smooth, and smooth sides appear cornered.

Janet Levin recommended a further modification regarding the temporal immediacy with which the once-blind must be tested. We need not satisfy Molyneux’s requirement that the identification of the shapes occur “at first sight” if we can otherwise establish “epistemic immediacy” — knowing something without applying inference or other rational strategies. Levin suggested that epistemic immediacy might be assured by using shape stimuli that are more similar to one another than a cube and sphere. Identifying a square from a square-like shape with convex sides may control for simple inferences, a control that provides novel prospects for future modifications.

5. Development as an Empirical Problem

Experimental considerations of Molyneux’s question quickly followed its publication. However, as no immediate cure of blindness has been forthcoming, two provisos are required to make the question more amenable to empirical investigation: sight is achievable by a slow process of visual restoration, and subjects need not be congenitally blind adult males. In lieu of these conditions, three central developments have been in use: ocular and neural surgery, adaptation to Sensory Substitution Devices, and developmental experiments on infants. The diagram below charts these developments by kind.



Thirty-six years after the publication of Molyneux’s question, the English surgeon William Cheselden published a report of his successful cataract operation that was so persuasive George Berkeley  considered it confirmation of his negative reply, as did many French philosophers, such as Voltaire. Cheselden’s young subject, who was only partially blind (he was able to distinguish night from day), was not able to recognize objects at first sight, though he knew them by touch. Similar experiments throughout the 18th, 19th, and 20th centuries confirmed Cheselden’s findings for many scientists.

Twenty-first century research reveals more nuanced results. Visual deprivation results in deterioration of the visual cortex. (For instance, one carefully studied patient who was blind for 40 years until undergoing cataract surgery at the age of 43 was able to appreciate the distance and size of objects after about five months of recovery, but remained unable to recognize people by their facial features or to appreciate depth such as line drawings of cubes. See Fine, 2003). This indicates that the areas of the brain dedicated to processing some spatial information remain in a deteriorated state, and that therefore, analysis of the experiences of individuals who once had cataracts may be less relevant to the query posed by Molyneux’s question, which concerns the nature of ideas acquired by sensory perception rather than the separate issue of visual impairment.

Held et al. (2011) re-tooled the cataract paradigm by given newly sighted subjects’ a second chance to identify shapes a few days after their initial failed tests; in the second test, each subject succeeded. The authors conclude a more nuanced answer of "initially no but subsequently yes.” In other words, visual deprivation causes transfer failure rather than preventing the creation of cross-modal representations: “The rapidity of acquisition suggests that the neuronal substrates responsible for cross-modal interaction might already be in place before they become behaviorally manifest (Held 2011: 552).” Their summary conclusion is that the neuronal structure for cross-modal transfer is available, but not utilizable due to its degenerated state caused by visual deprivation. This modified cataract paradigm is in support of an affirmative reply if one’s concern is cross-modal transfer. However, if one’s interest in the question concerns the effects of long-term visual deprivation, the modified paradigm supports a negative answer.

Cataract surgery is not the only surgical paradigm that has been applied to Molyneux’s question. Evans suggested using visual prostheses to directly stimulate the visual cortex, or areas along lower visual pathways such as the optic nerve and retina. This invasive technique has the novel and shocking result of producing "phosphenes"—lightning-like flashes produced in the mind's eye. Blind subjects reportedly are able to spatially organize phosphenes, recognizing motion and simple shapes. After significant training, they are even able to integrate these mental percepts into their behavior: they can localize, identify, and even grasp the corresponding tactile objects presented to them. Such techniques, however, have yet to undergo clinical trial and so remain merely suggestive of an affirmative reply.

A related theoretical observation concerns whether areas of the brain functionally reserved for processing information from one sense modality like touch can process information from another, like sight. Mriganka Sur found that surgically rerouting information from the retina of ferrets to both their auditory cortex and somotosensory cortex elicited responses in both when the subject was visually stimulated. This provides evidence for “crossmodal plasticity,” the claim that senses are functionally organized to process certain kinds of information such as spatially or temporally organized stimuli, rather than organized solely by inborn connections to sensory organs. Crossmodal plasticity is also supported by the observation that when blind subjects process auditory information, the visual cortex is active; this suggests that cortical rewiring is a natural occurrence. Further support comes from the phenomenon known as “synesthesia,” in which perception by one sensory modality includes the experiential character of another sensory modality—where, for instance, one “hears” colors. Surgical research influenced by Molyneux’s question has significantly advanced our understanding of both the long-term negative effects of sensory deprivation and the cortical plasticity of the brain, allowing for improved visual restoration of the once-blind.

Sensory Substitution Devices (SSDs)

Bach-y-Rita’s invention of a device created to simulate sensory experiences of one sensory modality in another has generated a number of experiments related to Molyneux’s question. One such device, the “BrainPort,” transfers visual information from a mobile camera to an electrode array placed on the tongue. Using BrainPorts, blind subjects are able to recognize objects from a distance by the electric stimulations that they feel on their tongue. Aside from anecdotal reports from SSD users, who say that after practice with the BrainPort they no longer feel the stimulation on their tongue but rather simply “see” the objects before them, there is evidence that when congenitally blind individuals use the device, areas in the brain reserved for visual processing are recruited. In the same study, a control group of sighted subjects were not found to have activation in the visual cortex after practiced use of the device, a result that provides intriguing insight into crossmodal plasticity. The use of SSDs seems to be a kind of Molyneux experiment, one that shows that the blind might recognize tactually familiar shapes by using augmentation device. See (Reich et al., 2012.) The use of these devices, however, is an experimental analogue to Molyneux’s question only to the degree that the device presents information visually—an unlikely claim as they more closely approximate an extension of the sensory modality being used.

Developmental Science

Newborn infants offer a unique window into the development of sensory concepts of shape. Like Molyneux’s question, Andrew Meltzoff’s imitation studies involve testing whether stimuli familiar to touch (such as, in his research, the familiarity of feeling one’s own facial expressions or facial proprioception) transfer to the recognition ability of what is seen at first sight. He demonstrated that infants a few weeks old imitate another person’s facial expressions, such as tongue protrusion and mouth opening, suggesting evidence in support of an affirmative reply. These results, however, have been contested by further research that has not been able to replicate Meltzoff’s findings. In another experiment testing Molyneux’s question, Meltzoff shows that oral tactile familiarity of pacifier textures, whether “bumpy” or “smooth,” influences visual recognition of these shapes, suggesting an affirmative reply. Infants who were orally habituated to the feel of a bumpy pacifier attended to the visually presented bumpy shape more often than to the smoothly textured pacifier, and vice-versa.

These results are consistent with Arlette Streri’s experiments, which involved habituating newborns to the feel of shapes in their right hand while preventing them from seeing them. Both shapes were then presented visually to the infants while their length of gaze and number of gazes were recorded. The shapes that were not held were looked at longer and more often, suggesting that shape concepts acquired by touch were communicated from touch to sight. A control group of infants who were not tactually habituated to shapes looked at the visually presented shapes for equal amounts of time, suggesting that prior tactile experience guided the infant’s attention. These results are consistent with an affirmative reply to Molyneux’s question.

6. Conclusion

A philosopher’s muse, Molyneux’s question continues to inspire insight and direct understanding about the mind and its contents. Future prospects of an empirical solution continually remain just beyond the reach of the cognitive sciences, stretching its methodology while extending the question’s application to novel experimental paradigms. The philosophical rewards from such future work promises to be as rich as those of the past and present.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Berkeley, George. 1709/1975. “An Essay Toward a New Theory of Vision.” Philosophical Works, Including the Works on Vision. (Edited by Michael R. Ayers.) London: J. M. Dent.
    • Defends a negative answer to Molyneux’s question in sections 132-159.
  • Berman, D. 1974/2009. “Francis Hutcheson on Berkeley and the Molyneux Problem.” Berkeley and Irish Philosophy. New York: Continuum Books: 138–148.
    • Interprets Hutcheson’s affirmative answer to Molyneux’s question.
  • Bruno, M., Mandelbaum, E. 2010. “Locke’s Answer to Molyneux’s Thought Experiment.” History of Philosophy Quarterly 27: 165–180.
    • Interprets Locke’s negative answer to Molyneux’s question.
  • Buffon C. 1749/1971. De l’homme. (Translated by M. Duchet) Paris: Masparo.
    • Defends a negative answer to Molyneux’s question in the chapter, “Du sens de la vue.”
  • Campbell J. 1996. “Molyneux’s Question.” Perception: Philosophical Issues 7. (Edited by Enrique Villanueva.) Atascadero, California: Ridgeview Publishing Company: 301–318.
    • Defends direct realism with an affirmation of Molyneux’s question.
  • Cheseldon, W. 1728. “An Account of Some Observations Made by a Young Gentleman, Who Was Born Blind, or Lost His Sight so Early, That He Had no Remembrance of Ever Having Seen, and Was Couch’d between 13 and 14 Years of Age.” Philosophical Transactions 35: 447–50.
    • Presents a famous case of a patient healed of cataracts.
  • Condillac, E. B. 1754/1930. Condillac's Treatise on the Sensations. (Translated by Geraldine Carr.) London: Favil Press.
    • Defends a negative answer to Molyneux’s question using the famous statue example.
  • Degenaar, M. 1996. Molyneux's Problem: Three Centuries of Discussion on the Perception of Forms. (Translated by Michael J. Collins) Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
    • Summarizes a history of answers to Molyneux’s Question.
  • Diderot, D. 1749/1972. “Letter on the Blind for the Use of Those who See.” Diderot's Early Philosophical Works. (Translated by Margaret Jourdain.) New York: Burt Franklin.
    • Recounts the life of Nicolas Saunderson, a blind mathematician, with a variety of proposed changes to Molyneux’s question.
  • Evans, G. 1985. “Molyneux’s Question.” Collected Papers. (Edited by John McDowell.) New York: Oxford UP.
    • Defends an affirmative answer to Molyneux’s question.
  • Fine, I., Wade, A., Brewer, A., May, M., Goodman, D., Boynton, G., Wandell, B., MacLeod, D. 2003. “Long-term Deprivation Affects Visual Perception and Cortex.” Nature Neuroscience 6 (9): 909–10.
    • Describes long-term effects of blindness after sight is restored by cataract surgery.
  • Gallagher, S. 2005. “Neurons and Neonates: Reflections on the Molyneux System.” How the Body Shapes the Mind. Oxford: Clarendon Press: 153–172.
    • Defends an affirmative answer to Molyneux’s question.
  • Glenney, B. 2013. “Philosophical Problems, Cluster Concepts and the Many Lives of Molyneux’s Question.” Biology and Philosophy 28 3: 541–558. DOI 10.1007/s10539-012-9355x
    • Defends a pluralist answer to Molyneux’s question.
  • Glenney, B. 2012. “Leibniz on Molyneux’s Question.” History of Philosophy Quarterly 29 3: 247–264.
    • Interprets Leibniz’s affirmative answer to Molyneux’s question.
  • Glenney, B. 2011. “Adam Smith and the Problem of the External World.” Journal of Scottish Philosophy 9 2: 205–223.
    • Interprets Smith’s affirmative answer to Molyneux’s question.
  • Grice, H. P. 1962/2011. “Some Remarks About the Senses.” The Senses: Classical and Contemporary Philosophical Perspectives. New York: Oxford UP: 83–100.
    • Defends the individuation of the senses based on experience.
  • Held, R., Ostrovsky, Y., deGelder, B., Gandhi, T., Ganesh, S., Mathur, U. and Sinha, P. 2011. 
Newly Sighted Cannot Match Seen with Felt.
Nature Neuroscience 14: 551–553.
    • Describes a new paradigm for testing visual identification of tactilely-familiar shapes by subjects recently cured of cataracts.
  • Levin, J. 2008. “Molyneux’s Question and the Individuation of Perceptual Concepts.” Philosophical Studies 139 1: 1–28.
    • Defends the claim that the same concepts are deployed when seeing and touching shapes.
  • Liu, Z., Kersten, D., Knill, D. 1999. “Dissociating Stimulus Information from Internal Representation—A Case Study in Object Recognition.” Vision Research 39: 603–612.
    • Describes a modification to Molyneux’s question using phosphenes with results that support an affirmative answer.
  • Locke, J., 1688/1978. The Correspondence of John Locke 3. (Edited by E. S. De Beer.) Oxford: Clarendon Press: 482–3.
    • Molyneux first poses his question in Letter 1064 (7 July, 1688).
  • Locke, J. 1694/1979. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. (Edited by Peter H. Nidditch.) Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Defends a negative answer to Molyneux’s question in II.ix.
  • Lotze, H. 1887. Metaphysic. (Edited by Bernard Mosanquet.) Oxford: Clarendon Press. Vol. II.
    • Defends a negative answer to Molyneux’s question.
  • Macpherson, F. 2011. The Senses: Classical and Contemporary Philosophical Perspectives. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Presents theories on how the senses are to be individuated.
  • Meltzoff, A. N. 1993. “Molyneux’s Babies: Cross-modal Perception, Imitation, and the Mind of the Preverbal Infant.” Spatial Representation. Cambridge: Blackwell: 219–235.
    • Describes visual identification of tactilely familiar shapes by infants.
  • Morgan, Michael J. 1977. Molyneux's question: vision, touch, and the philosophy of perception. New York: Cambridge UP.
    • Summarizes a history of answers to Molyneux’s Question.
  • Noë, A. 2004. Action in Perception. Cambridge, Massachusetts.: MIT Press.
    • Defends an affirmative answer to Molyneux’s question.
  • Prinz, J. 2002. Furnishing the Mind: Concepts and Their Perceptual Basis. Cambridge, Massachusetts: MIT Press.
    • Defends an affirmative answer to Molyneux’s question in Chapter 5.
  • Reich, L., Maidenbaum, S., Amedi, A. “The Brain as a Flexible Task Machine: Implications for Visual Rehabilitation using Noninvasive vs. Invasive Approaches. Current Opinion in Neurology 25 1 2012: 86-95.
    • Describes uses and implications of Sensory Substitution Devices.
  • Sassen, B. 2004, “Kant on Molyneux’s Problem.” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 12, 3: 471–485.
    • Interprets Kant’s possible answer to Molyneux’s question.
  • Streri, A., Gentaz, E. 2003. “Cross-modal Recognition of Shape from Hand to Eyes and Handedness in Human Newborns.” Somatosensory & Motor Research 20 1: 11–16.
    • Describes visual identification of tactilely-familiar shapes by infants.
  • Sur, M., Pallas, S., Roe, A. 1990. “Cross-modal Plasticity in Cortical Development: Differentiation and Specification of Sensory Neocortex.” Trends in Neurosciences 13 6: 227–233.
    • Describes an experiment re-routing sensory information from vision to audition and touch in ferrets.
  • Thomson, J. 1974. “Molyneux's Problem.” The Journal of Philosophy 71 18: 637–650.
    • Defends an affirmative answer to Molyneux’s question.
  • Van Cleve, J. 2007. “Reid’s Answer to Molyneux’s Question.” The Monist 90 2: 251–270.
    • Interprets Reid’s answer to Molyneux’s question.


Author Information

Brian Glenney
Gordon College
U. S. A.

Bertrand Russell: Ethics

russellThis article confines itself to Bertrand Russell's conversion from ethical cognitivism (similar to G. E. Moore) to ethical non-cognitivism (similar to Ayer).  Russell’s conversion is not only historically important, as it contributes to the rise of metaethics, but it also clarifies the central issues between cognitivism and non-cognitivism.

Traditionally, ethics has been understood as a branch of philosophy that focuses on normative value in human conduct; it is the search for a rationally defensible view concerning what things are good (worth aiming at), which actions are right, and why. However, the tradition took a peculiar turn in the context of 20th century analytic philosophy.   Here, philosophers began to focus on the meanings of ethical terms and claims, rather than on the elements of right conduct.   This was the birth of what we nowadays call “metaethics,” over against which the focus on normative theory—the mainstream of Western philosophical ethics from Aristotle to G. E. Moore—has come to be called “normative ethics.   Current fashion divides ethics into three sub branches: normative ethics, metaethics and applied ethics. This distinction became necessary after the rise of metaethics in the first half of the twentieth century. Unlike normative ethics, metaethics mainly concentrates on the meanings of fundamental ethical terms, and on ethical method.

The first mature exposition of Russell's ethical views is found in his essay "The Elements of Ethics" (1910).  “The Elements” expounds an ethics largely based on G. E. Moore's Principia Ethica. When he wrote it, Russell was, like Moore, a cognitivist in ethics.  That is to say, he believed that ethical statements such as "X is good", express propositions that have truth-value (that is, are either true or false) independent of our opinions and emotions. However, the cognitivist phase of Russell's thinking did not last long. Soon he moved from ethical cognitivism to ethical non-cognitivism, which denies that ethical statements have truth-value. The change was mainly brought about by Santayana's criticism of “The Elements” in his book Winds of Doctrine (1913).

An exposition of Russell's ethical non-cognitivism in its developed form is found in Religion and Science (1935). This was published one year before A. J. Ayer's Language, Truth and Logic, which was to become the most famous exposition of ethical non-cognitivism in the first half of the twentieth century. There are two aspects of Russell's ethical ideas as expressed in Religion and Science: (1) that ethical statements are not fact-stating though they seem to be so when expressed in indicative mood, and (2) they are optative or desire expressing.

Russell's final ethical views are to be found in Human Society in Ethics and Politics (1954), which might be regarded as Russell's most important ethical writing. In Human Society, Russell adopts as his guiding principle David Hume's maxim, "Reason is, and ought, only to be the slave of the passions.”

Table of Contents

  1. Writings on Ethics
  2. Russell's Concept of Ethics
  3. Evolution of Russell's Ethical Ideas
    1. Adolescent View
    2. Philosophical Essays
    3. Transition from Cognitivism to Non-Cognitivism
    4. What I Believe
    5. An Outline of Philosophy
    6. Religion and Science
    7. Human Society in Ethics and Politics
  4. Russell, Ayer and Subsequent Ethics
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Writings on Ethics

Bertrand Russell was a prolific writer. He wrote on different branches of philosophy, including logic, epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, social and political philosophy, philosophy of religion and philosophy of mathematics. His three most important ethical writings are "The Elements of Ethics" (1910), Religion and Science (1935), and Human Society in Ethics and Politics (1954). In "The Elements" Russell expounds an ethics largely based on G. E. Moore's Principia Ethica. An exposition of Russell's ethical non-cognitivism in its developed form is found in Religion and Science, whereas Russell's final ethical views are to be found in Human Society in Ethics and Politics, which might be regarded as his most important ethical writing. Russell had originally intended to include the discussion on ethics in his Human Knowledge, but he decided not to do so because he was uncertain as to the sense in which ethics can be regarded as "knowledge.”

Apart from the works mentioned above, What I Believe (1925), An Outline of Philosophy (1927), "Reply to Criticism" in The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell (1946) and Bertrand Russell Speaks His Mind (1960) contain valuable material on Russell's ethics.

2. Russell's Concept of Ethics

Except for a short time as a cognitivist under the influence of G. E. Moore, Russell was consistently an ethical non-cognitivist.  That is to say, he did not believe that there is any such thing as objective ethical facts:  “When we assert that this or that has ‘value’”, says Russell, "we are giving expression to our own emotions, not to a fact which would still be true if our personal feelings were different." (Russell 1949, 230-31)   This perspective has important implications for his concept of Ethics as a philosophical sub-discipline, and as a purported field of knowledge.  In both cases, Russell thinks Ethics fails to qualify.

In his An Outline of Philosophy, Russell begins his discussion of ethics with the following words: "Ethics is traditionally a department of philosophy, and that is my reason for discussing it. I hardly think myself that it ought to be included in the domain of philosophy, but to prove this would take as long as to discuss the subject itself, and would be less interesting." (180)  Russell's reasons for excluding ethics from the domain of philosophy become clearer in his Religion and Science.  Because of his non-cogntivism, Russell thinks that questions as to "values"—that is to say, as to what is good or bad on its own account, independently of its effects—lie outside the domain of science.  From this, Russell draws the further conclusion that questions about "values" lie wholly outside the domain of knowledge. And this in turn has implications for the place of Ethics in philosophy.

Russell regarded philosophy as a kind of incomplete science, a search for certainty in the sphere where certain knowledge is not yet achieved but remains possible. However, since Russell rejects the existence of ethics facts, ethical knowledge (certain or otherwise) is not even possible.   Therefore, while Russell regarded the argument proving the impossibility of ethical knowledge as part of philosophy, normative theory—the traditional business of philosophical ethics—was excluded from philosophy proper.  Thus, although Russell originally intended to include his Human Society in Ethics and Politics in his book Human Knowledge, as he says in the preface to the former, he decided not to do so because he was uncertain as to the sense in which ethics can be regarded as "knowledge.”

In his "Reply to Criticism" in The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, Russell reaffirms this view, repeating that he would like to exclude all value judgments from philosophy "except that this would be too violent a breach with usage, " (719), and insisting that the only matter concerned with ethics that can be "properly" regarded as belonging to philosophy is the argument that ethical propositions should be expressed in optative mood, not in the indicative.

3. Evolution of Russell's Ethical Ideas

The main shift in his ethical thinking was from ethical cognitivism (similar to G. E. Moore) to non-cognitivism (similar to Ayer), but Russell's ethical ideas did not remain the same throughout his philosophical career.

a. Adolescent View

In his youth, Russell took the utilitarian view that the "happiness of mankind should be the aim of all actions" (Russell 1978, 39) to be so obviously true that he was surprised to find, upon entering Cambridge, that there were alternative ethical theories.  At this stage, he took "the greatest happiness of the greatest number" as his ideal.

Russell moved away from his youthful utilitarianism because of what he calls "moral experience.” (Russell 1978, 161)

According to Russell, circumstances are apt to generate perfectly concrete moral convictions, and it is often impossible to judge beforehand what one's moral opinion of a fact will be.

In a letter written to Gilbert Murray in 1902, Russell says, "what first turned me away from utilitarinism was the persuasion that I myself ought to pursue philosophy, although I had (and have still) no doubt that by doing economics and the theory of politics I could add more to human happiness." It appeared to Russell that the dignity of which human existence is capable is not attainable by "devotion to the mechanism of life", and that unless the contemplation of "eternal things" is preserved, humankind will become "no better than well-fed pigs.” However, Russell did not believe that such contemplation overall tends to happiness. As he says, "it gives moments of delight, but these are outweighed by years of effort and depression.” (Russell 1978, 161)

b. Philosophical Essays

The first mature exposition of Russell's ethical views is found in "The Elements of Ethics," an essay in his book Philosophical Essays (1910). In "The Elements" Russell expounds an ethics largely based on G. E. Moore's Principia Ethica.

He believed that (1) "good" is the most fundamental ethical concept and (2) that "good" is indefinable. He further maintained that we know a priori certain propositions about the kind of things that are good on their own account. In addition, that when we make a statement such as "X is good", we make a statement like "this table is round", which is either true or false, and whose truth or falsity is independent of our opinions and emotions. So, at the time of writing "The Elements" Russell was, like Moore, a cognitivist in ethics.

According to Moore, the pleasure of human intercourse and the enjoyment of beautiful objects are the most valuable things we know or imagine. Russell, on the other hand, gives no such list of things which are good in themselves, since he holds that his readers are competent to judge what things are good and what bad.

Roughly speaking, Russell's conception of "right" in "The Elements" is also the same as that of Moore's conception of right or duty. Irrespective of details, both Moore and Russell regard consequences or results as of vital importance for judging an action as right or wrong. In other words both are teleologists or consequentialists, like the utilitarians.

Russell, however, also allows for what he calls a "subjective" sense of “right.” According to Russell, if a person asks himself, "what ought I to do?" and then acts on his answer, that is to say, what he or she judges to be right after an appropriate amount of candid thought—the appropriate amount of thought being dependent on the difficulty and importance of the decision—then he may be regarded as acting rightly in the subjective sense, even if his action is not objectively right. An action is called "objectively right" by Russell when "of all that are possible it is the one which will probably have the best results.” Moore, on the other hand, makes no such distinction between right in the subjective sense and right in the objective sense.

c. Transition from Cognitivism to Non-Cognitivism

The cognitivist phase of Russell's thinking did not last long. Soon he started moving from ethical cognitivism to ethical non-cognitivism. The change was mainly brought about by Santayana's criticism of Russell's "The Elements" in the former’s book Winds of Doctrine (1913). The main thrust of Santayana's criticism was that "good" cannot be totally independent of human interests and feelings; and that propositions about intrinsic goodness—if they can be called propositions at all—cannot be true or false in a manner in which propositions in physical sciences are, because they are not statements about certain objective state of affairs but are only expressions of "preferences we feel." As he says, "to speak of the truth of an ultimate good would be a false collocation of terms; an ultimate good is chosen, found or aimed at; it is not opined.” (Santayana 1913, 143-44)

Santayana is also at pains to emphasize that "good" cannot be totally independent of human interests and feelings. As he says, "For the human system whiskey is truly more intoxicating than coffee, and the contrary opinion would be an error; but what a strange way of vindicating this real, though relative distinction to insist that whiskey is more intoxicating in itself, without reference to any animal; that it is pervaded, as it were, by an inherent intoxication, and stands dead drunk in its bottle!" (Jager 1972, 473)

Another factor, apart from Santayana's criticism, which stimulated the change in Russell's ethical thinking, was the impact of the First World War, which Russell passionately opposed. The war forced him to think afresh on a number of fundamental questions. For instance, Russell was forced to revise his views on human nature. As he says in his Autobiography, in his endeavour to understand popular feelings about war, he arrived at a view of human passions similar to that of psychoanalysts. Russell started believing that fundamental facts "in all ethical questions are feelings", (Russell 1917, 19) and that impulse has more effect in moulding human lives than conscious purpose.

d. What I Believe

The second published work to discuss Russell’s ethics in some detail is What I Believe (1925). In this small book, included in The Basic Writings of Bertrand Russell, Russell clearly says that ethical disagreements about the good life are amenable to argument only when men differ as to the means to achieve a given end. But when there is a real difference as to ends, no argument is possible. "I cannot, therefore," says Russell, "prove that my view of the good life is right; I can only state my view, and hope that as many as possible will agree." (Egner and Dennon 1961, 372)

Russell's view is that the good life is one inspired by love and guided by knowledge. According to Russell, neither love without knowledge nor knowledge without love can produce a good life; but love is in a sense more fundamental, since it will lead intelligent people to seek knowledge in order to find out how to benefit those whom they love.

Russell clarifies that by "knowledge" he does not mean "ethical knowledge.” (In fact, he did not believe that there is, strictly speaking, any such knowledge.) By "knowledge" Russell means "scientific knowledge and knowledge of particular facts." (374) He considers such knowledge important, because if we desire to achieve some end, knowledge may show us the means, and this knowledge, according to Russell, may loosely pass as "ethical.” "Given an end to be achieved," says Russell, "it is a question for science to discover how to achieve it. All moral rules must be tested by examining whether they tend to realize ends that we desire."(374)

So, Russell is already linking "good" with the desired, a theme to which, as we shall see, he returns again and again. He says emphatically "outside human desires there is no moral standard." (375)

e. An Outline of Philosophy

In An Outline of Philosophy, Russell approaches the problem of ethics with the question, "What is meant when a person says 'You ought to do so-and-so' or ' I ought to do so-and-so'?" and gives the reply that "primarily a sentence of this sort has an emotional content"; it means "this is the act towards which I feel the emotion of approval.” However, Russell notes, "we do not wish to leave the matter there; we want to find something more objective and systematic and constant than a personal emotion." (181)

Russell points out that when the ethical teacher says, "you ought to approve acts of such-and-such kinds," he generally gives reasons for his view, and proceeds to examine "what sorts of reasons are possible." (181)

In this context, Russell refers to the utilitarian doctrine that happiness is the good and we ought to act so as to maximize the balance of happiness over unhappiness in the world, and says: "I should not myself regard happiness as an adequate definition of the good, but I should agree that conduct ought to be judged by its consequences." According to Russell, "right conduct" is not an autonomous concept, but means "conduct calculated to produce desirable results." This leads him to ask, "How can we discover what constitutes the ends of right conduct?"

At this point Russell, first, refers to the fact that on this issue he earlier held views similar to those of G. E. Moore, which he was led to abandon "partly by Mr. Santayana's Winds of Doctrine." And then he declares, "I now think that good and bad are derivative from desire." He points out that there is a conflict between desires of different men and incompatible desires of the same man and says that good is "mainly a social concept, designed to find an issue from this conflict."(183-84)

Thus, two things are clear. First, Russell, when he wrote What I Believe and An Outline of Philosophy had ceased to be a cognitivist. Second,  he had now started moving towards the view that good was a social concept derived from desire. However, in these two books we find only a rough outline of a new theory that is emerging. We find an exposition of Russell's non-cognitivism in more developed form in Religion and Science.

f. Religion and Science

An exposition of Russell's ethical non-cognitivism in its developed form is found in Religion and Science (1935), which was published one year before A. J. Ayer's exposition of the emotivist theory of ethics in Language, Truth and Logic. Russell retains his view from "The Elements" that defining "good" is the fundamental problem of ethics. According to him, once "good" is defined, the rest of ethics follows: we ought to act in the way we believe most likely to create as much good as possible, and as little of its correlative evil. In other words, once we define "good", framing of moral rules is a matter for science.

However, Russell argues that when we try to be definite as to what we mean by "good", we land ourselves in great difficulties, because—unlike with scientific questions—there is no factual evidence about value. Disputants can only appeal to their own emotions, and employ rhetorical devices to rouse similar emotions in others. According to Russell, when we assert that this or that has value, we are giving expression to our emotions, not to a fact which would still be true if our personal feelings were different. When a person says "this is good in itself," he seems to be making a statement like "this is square" or "this is sweet.” Nevertheless, what he really means, according to Russell, is "I wish everybody to desire this" or "Would that everybody desire this.” (235)  The first of these sentences, which may be true or false, does not, says Russell, belong to ethics but to psychology or biography. The second sentence which does belong to ethics, expresses a desire for something, but asserts nothing; and since it asserts nothing it is logically impossible that there should be evidence for or against it, or for it to possess either truth or falsehood.

In sum, there are two main aspects to Russell’s metaethical views in Religion  and Science.  First, ethical statements are not fact-stating (though they seem to be so when expressed in indicative mood).  Second, they are instead optative, or desire-expressing. This link between “good” and desire is already familiar from An Outline of Philosophy.  Prima facie, according to Russell, anything we all desire is good and anything we all dread is bad. If we all agreed in our desires, says Russell, the matter could be left there, but in fact, desires of human beings conflict. In this conflict each tries to enlist allies by showing that his own desires harmonize with those of other people. Therefore, ethics, according to Russell, is closely related to politics: it is an attempt to bring the collective desires of group to bear upon individuals and, conversely, it is an attempt by an individual to cause his desires to become those of his group. In this way, according to Russell, ethics contains no statement whether true or false, but consists of desires of a certain general kind, namely, such as are concerned with desires of humankind in general.

g. Human Society in Ethics and Politics

Russell's final ethical views are to be found in Human Society in Ethics and Politics (1954), which might be regarded as his most important ethical work. As he says in the preface of the Human Society, he originally intended to include the discussion of ethics in his book Human Knowledge, but he decided not to do so, because he was uncertain as to the sense in which ethics can be regarded as "knowledge.” The book, Russell claimed, has two purposes: first, to set forth an undogmatic ethic; and second, to apply this ethic to various current political problems.

Russell adopts as his guiding principle David Hume's maxim that "Reason is, and ought, only to be the slave of the passions.” According to Russell, desires, emotions or passions are the only possible causes of action. Reason is not a cause of action but only a regulator. "The world that I should wish to see," says Russell, 'is one where emotions are strong but not destructive, and where, because they are acknowledged, they lead to no deception either of oneself or of others. Such a world would include love and friendship and the pursuit of art and knowledge." (11)

In effect, what Russell says in Human Society, is not very different from what he says in Religion and Science; when an ethical disagreement is about means for achieving certain ends, it can be resolved by the use of reason; but when the disagreement is about ends reason is of no help, because what ends we pursue depends ultimately on our desires.

As in Religion and Science, Russell is also at pains to emphasize that our desires are not "irrational" just because we cannot give any reason for them. According to Russell, a desire cannot, in itself, be either rational or irrational. We may desire A because it is a means to B, but in the end, when we have done with mere means we must come to something, which we desire for no reasons. Nevertheless, the desire cannot be called irrational merely because no reasons can be given for feeling it.

However, Russell's dissatisfaction with his own theory of ethics, which earlier finds an expression in "Reply to Criticism" (1946) reappears in Human Society and we find him wondering once again whether there is such a thing as ethical knowledge. In an important passage he says: "It may be that there is some … way of arriving at objectivity in ethics; if so, since it must involve appeal to the majority, it will take us from personal ethics into the sphere of politics, which is, in fact, very difficult to separate from ethics."(26-27)

Russell sums up his efforts to arrive at an objective ethics in the following fundamental propositions and definitions:

(1) Surveying the acts which arouse emotions of approval or disapproval, we find that, as a general rule, the acts which are approved of are those believed likely to have, on the balance, effects of certain kinds while opposite effects are expected from acts that are disapproved of.

(2) Effects that lead to approval are defined as "good" and those leading to disapproval are as "bad.”

 (3) An act of which, on the available evidence, the effects are likely to be better than those of any other act that is possible in the circumstances, is defined as "right"; any other act is "wrong.” What we "ought" to do is, by definition, the act which is right.

(4) It is right to feel approval of a right act and disapproval of a wrong act. (115-16)

According to Russell, these definitions and propositions, if accepted, provide a coherent body of ethical propositions, which are true (or false) in the same sense as if they were propositions of science. He admits that different societies in different ages have given approval to a wide diversity of acts; but, argues Russell, the difference between ourselves and other ages in these respects is attributable to a difference between our beliefs and theirs as to the effects of actions. Thus, Russell is led to the conclusion that there is more agreement among humankind as to the effects that we should aim than as to the kinds of acts that are approved. "I think", he says, " the contention of Henry Sidgwick, that acts which are approved of are those that are likely to bring happiness or pleasure, is, broadly speaking, true.” (117)

If it is admitted, Russell points out, that the great majority of approved acts are such as are believed to have certain effects, and it is found, further, that exceptional acts, which are approved without having this character, tend to be no longer approved when their exceptional character is realized; then it becomes possible, in a certain sense, to speak of ethical error. We may say, according to Russell, that it is "wrong" to approve of such exceptional acts, meaning that such approval does not have the effects which mark the great majority of approved acts.

Although on the above theory, ethics contains statements, which are true or false, and not merely optative or imperative, Russell points out that its basis is still one of emotion and feeling. The emotion of approval is involved in the definition of "right" and "wrong" and the feeling of enjoyment or satisfaction is involved in the definition of "good" or "intrinsic value.” Thus, according to Russell, the appeal upon which we depend for the acceptance of our ethical theory is not the appeal to the facts of perception, but to emotions and feelings, which have given rise to the concepts of "right" and "wrong", "good" and "bad.”

Interestingly, in his Autobiography, Russell summarizes his conclusion in Human Society in Ethics and Politics in the following manner: "The conclusion that I reach is that ethics is never an independent constituent, but is reducible to politics in the last analysis." (523) He reiterates that there is no such thing as ethical knowledge, and that "reason is, and ought only to be, the slave of the passions." An ethical opinion, maintains Russell, can only be defended by an ethical axiom, but if the axiom is not accepted, there is no way of reaching a rational conclusion.

There is, according to Russell, one approximately rational approach to ethics, which he calls "the doctrine of compossibility.” Russell defines "compossible desires” as desires which can be satisfied together, that is, those which do not conflict with one another. According to the doctrine of compossibility, the person who wishes to be happy should try to guide his life by the largest possible set of compossible desires. Similarly, a world in which the aims of different individuals or groups is compossible is likely to be happier than one in which they are conflicting. Therefore, says Russell, it should be part of a wise social system to encourage compossible purposes and discourage conflicting ones, by means of education and social systems designed to this end. However, Russell feels that from a theoretical point of view this doctrine affords no ultimate solution, because it assumes that happiness is better than unhappiness, which, according to him, is an ethical principle incapable of proof.

Two things emerge out of this survey of Russell's ethical thinking: (i) Russell's concept of "right" remains largely the same throughout his career, and that concept is, broadly speaking, utilitarian: right action is that action which leads to good results; (ii) though Russell consistently regards "good" as the most fundamental ethical concept, his view of what good is or whether we can know at all what good is changes over time. However, his final ethical views on this issue are much closer to utilitarianism than to any other classical ethical theory, as is shown by his approval of Sidgwick's contention  that "acts which are approved of are those that are likely to bring happiness or pleasure.” In place of classical utilitarianism’s "happiness", Russell prefers to speak of "satisfaction of desires.” In Human Society itself, for example, Russell defines "good" as "satisfaction of desire.” According to him, this definition is more consonant with the ethical feelings of the majority of humankind than any other theoretically defensible definition.

4. Russell, Ayer and Subsequent Ethics

As we have seen, the main shift in Russell's ethical thinking was from cognitivism to non-cognitivism. Russell shares this non-cognitivist perspective with ethical thinkers such as A. J. Ayer, C. L. Stevenson, R. M Hare and P. H. Nowell-Smith. The common core of non-cognitivism is the denial that ethical claims have factual contents and corresponding truth-values.  However, when non-cogntivists turn from telling us what ethical statements are not to telling us what they are, they frequently differ from one another in many of the details.  Russell’s non-cogntivism differs from other versions in several ways.

First, Russell’s positive account of ethical statements focuses mainly on desires. Therefore, his analysis of ethical terms is more appropriately described as optative than, for example, emotive (Ayer, Stevenson) or prescriptive (Hare).

Second, Russell's optative analysis of ethical terms applies mainly to "good" (as an end), which Russell regarded as the most fundamental ethical term. As far as the analysis of "right" is concerned, Russell was a consequentialist throughout his philosophical career.

Third, Russell shows a greater awareness than many non-cognitivists of his era of the social importance or social function of ethical concepts. For example, he clearly says in An Outline of Philosophy that "good" is mainly a social concept "designed to find an issue" [that is, an outcome, a resolution] from conflict of desires—between desires of different persons, and incompatible desires of the same person. He also adds that the primary use of “good” is to label things we individually desire, but, since language is a social institution, “good” gradually comes to apply to things desired by the whole social group.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Egner, Robert E. and Dennon, Lester E. (ed.), The Basic Writings of Bertrand Russell (New York: Simon and Schuster, 1961)
  • Russell, Bertrand, An Outline of Philosophy (London: Unwin Paperbacks, 1979)
  • Russell, Bertrand, Human Society in Ethics and Politics (London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1954)
  • Russell, Bertrand, Justice in Wartime (Nottingham: Spokesman Books, 1917)
  • Russell, Bertrand, Philosophical Essays (New York: Simon and Schuster, 1966)
  • Russell, Bertrand, Religion and Science (London: Oxford University Press, 1949) Russell, Bertrand, Bertrand Russell Speaks His Mind (London: Arthur Barker, 1961)
  • Russell, Bertrand, The Autobiography of Bertrand Russell (London: Unwin Paperbacks, 1978)

b. Secondary Sources

  • Ayer, A. J., Language, Truth and Logic (England: Penguin Books Ltd., 1976)
  • Jager, Ronald, The Development of Bertrand Russell's Philosophy (London:
  • George Allen and Unwin, 1972)
  • Moore, G. E., Principia Ethica (London: Cambridge university Press, 1965)
  • Nath, Ramendra, The Ethical Philosophy of Bertrand Russell (New York: Vantage Press, 1993)
  • Pigden, Charles R., Russell on Ethics: Selections from Writings of Bertrand Russell (London and New York: Routledge, 1999)
  • Potter, Michael K., Bertrand Russell's Ethics (London and New York: Continuum, 2006)
  • Santayana, G., Winds of Doctrine (London: J. M. Dent & Sons Ltd. 1913)
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur (ed.), The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell (Evaston, Illinois: The Library of Living Philosophers Inc., 1946)


Author Information

Ramendra Nath
Patna University