The field of ethics (or moral philosophy) involves systematizing, defending, and recommending concepts of right and wrong behavior. Philosophers today usually divide ethical theories into three general subject areas: metaethics, normative ethics, and applied ethics. Metaethics investigates where our ethical principles come from, and what they mean. Are they merely social inventions? Do they involve more than expressions of our individual emotions? Metaethical answers to these questions focus on the issues of universal truths, the will of God, the role of reason in ethical judgments, and the meaning of ethical terms themselves. Normative ethics takes on a more practical task, which is to arrive at moral standards that regulate right and wrong conduct. This may involve articulating the good habits that we should acquire, the duties that we should follow, or the consequences of our behavior on others. Finally, applied ethics involves examining specific controversial issues, such as abortion, infanticide, animal rights, environmental concerns, homosexuality, capital punishment, or nuclear war.
By using the conceptual tools of metaethics and normative ethics, discussions in applied ethics try to resolve these controversial issues. The lines of distinction between metaethics, normative ethics, and applied ethics are often blurry. For example, the issue of abortion is an applied ethical topic since it involves a specific type of controversial behavior. But it also depends on more general normative principles, such as the right of self-rule and the right to life, which are litmus tests for determining the morality of that procedure. The issue also rests on metaethical issues such as, “where do rights come from?” and “what kind of beings have rights?”
Table of Contents
- Normative Ethics
- Applied Ethics
- References and Further Reading
The term “meta” means after or beyond, and, consequently, the notion of metaethics involves a removed, or bird’s eye view of the entire project of ethics. We may define metaethics as the study of the origin and meaning of ethical concepts. When compared to normative ethics and applied ethics, the field of metaethics is the least precisely defined area of moral philosophy. It covers issues from moral semantics to moral epistemology. Two issues, though, are prominent: (1) metaphysical issues concerning whether morality exists independently of humans, and (2) psychological issues concerning the underlying mental basis of our moral judgments and conduct.
Metaphysics is the study of the kinds of things that exist in the universe. Some things in the universe are made of physical stuff, such as rocks; and perhaps other things are nonphysical in nature, such as thoughts, spirits, and gods. The metaphysical component of metaethics involves discovering specifically whether moral values are eternal truths that exist in a spirit-like realm, or simply human conventions. There are two general directions that discussions of this topic take, one other-worldly and one this-worldly.
Proponents of the other-worldly view typically hold that moral values are objective in the sense that they exist in a spirit-like realm beyond subjective human conventions. They also hold that they are absolute, or eternal, in that they never change, and also that they are universal insofar as they apply to all rational creatures around the world and throughout time. The most dramatic example of this view is Plato, who was inspired by the field of mathematics. When we look at numbers and mathematical relations, such as 1+1=2, they seem to be timeless concepts that never change, and apply everywhere in the universe. Humans do not invent numbers, and humans cannot alter them. Plato explained the eternal character of mathematics by stating that they are abstract entities that exist in a spirit-like realm. He noted that moral values also are absolute truths and thus are also abstract, spirit-like entities. In this sense, for Plato, moral values are spiritual objects. Medieval philosophers commonly grouped all moral principles together under the heading of “eternal law” which were also frequently seen as spirit-like objects. 17th century British philosopher Samuel Clarke described them as spirit-like relationships rather than spirit-like objects. In either case, though, they exist in a spirit-like realm. A different other-worldly approach to the metaphysical status of morality is divine commands issuing from God’s will. Sometimes called voluntarism (or divine command theory), this view was inspired by the notion of an all-powerful God who is in control of everything. God simply wills things, and they become reality. He wills the physical world into existence, he wills human life into existence and, similarly, he wills all moral values into existence. Proponents of this view, such as medieval philosopher William of Ockham, believe that God wills moral principles, such as “murder is wrong,” and these exist in God’s mind as commands. God informs humans of these commands by implanting us with moral intuitions or revealing these commands in scripture.
The second and more this-worldly approach to the metaphysical status of morality follows in the skeptical philosophical tradition, such as that articulated by Greek philosopher Sextus Empiricus, and denies the objective status of moral values. Technically, skeptics did not reject moral values themselves, but only denied that values exist as spirit-like objects, or as divine commands in the mind of God. Moral values, they argued, are strictly human inventions, a position that has since been called moral relativism. There are two distinct forms of moral relativism. The first is individual relativism, which holds that individual people create their own moral standards. Friedrich Nietzsche, for example, argued that the superhuman creates his or her morality distinct from and in reaction to the slave-like value system of the masses. The second is cultural relativism which maintains that morality is grounded in the approval of one’s society – and not simply in the preferences of individual people. This view was advocated by Sextus, and in more recent centuries by Michel Montaigne and William Graham Sumner. In addition to espousing skepticism and relativism, this-worldly approaches to the metaphysical status of morality deny the absolute and universal nature of morality and hold instead that moral values in fact change from society to society throughout time and throughout the world. They frequently attempt to defend their position by citing examples of values that differ dramatically from one culture to another, such as attitudes about polygamy, homosexuality and human sacrifice.
A second area of metaethics involves the psychological basis of our moral judgments and conduct, particularly understanding what motivates us to be moral. We might explore this subject by asking the simple question, “Why be moral?” Even if I am aware of basic moral standards, such as don’t kill and don’t steal, this does not necessarily mean that I will be psychologically compelled to act on them. Some answers to the question “Why be moral?” are to avoid punishment, to gain praise, to attain happiness, to be dignified, or to fit in with society.
One important area of moral psychology concerns the inherent selfishness of humans. 17th century British philosopher Thomas Hobbes held that many, if not all, of our actions are prompted by selfish desires. Even if an action seems selfless, such as donating to charity, there are still selfish causes for this, such as experiencing power over other people. This view is called psychological egoism and maintains that self-oriented interests ultimately motivate all human actions. Closely related to psychological egoism is a view called psychological hedonism which is the view that pleasure is the specific driving force behind all of our actions. 18th century British philosopher Joseph Butler agreed that instinctive selfishness and pleasure prompt much of our conduct. However, Butler argued that we also have an inherent psychological capacity to show benevolence to others. This view is called psychological altruism and maintains that at least some of our actions are motivated by instinctive benevolence.
A second area of moral psychology involves a dispute concerning the role of reason in motivating moral actions. If, for example, I make the statement “abortion is morally wrong,” am I making a rational assessment or only expressing my feelings? On the one side of the dispute, 18th century British philosopher David Hume argued that moral assessments involve our emotions, and not our reason. We can amass all the reasons we want, but that alone will not constitute a moral assessment. We need a distinctly emotional reaction in order to make a moral pronouncement. Reason might be of service in giving us the relevant data, but, in Hume’s words, “reason is, and ought to be, the slave of the passions.” Inspired by Hume’s anti-rationalist views, some 20th century philosophers, most notably A.J. Ayer, similarly denied that moral assessments are factual descriptions. For example, although the statement “it is good to donate to charity” may on the surface look as though it is a factual description about charity, it is not. Instead, a moral utterance like this involves two things. First, I (the speaker) I am expressing my personal feelings of approval about charitable donations and I am in essence saying “Hooray for charity!” This is called the emotive element insofar as I am expressing my emotions about some specific behavior. Second, I (the speaker) am trying to get you to donate to charity and am essentially giving the command, “Donate to charity!” This is called the prescriptive element in the sense that I am prescribing some specific behavior.
From Hume’s day forward, more rationally-minded philosophers have opposed these emotive theories of ethics (see non-cognitivism in ethics) and instead argued that moral assessments are indeed acts of reason. 18th century German philosopher Immanuel Kant is a case in point. Although emotional factors often do influence our conduct, he argued, we should nevertheless resist that kind of sway. Instead, true moral action is motivated only by reason when it is free from emotions and desires. A recent rationalist approach, offered by Kurt Baier (1958), was proposed in direct opposition to the emotivist and prescriptivist theories of Ayer and others. Baier focuses more broadly on the reasoning and argumentation process that takes place when making moral choices. All of our moral choices are, or at least can be, backed by some reason or justification. If I claim that it is wrong to steal someone’s car, then I should be able to justify my claim with some kind of argument. For example, I could argue that stealing Smith’s car is wrong since this would upset her, violate her ownership rights, or put the thief at risk of getting caught. According to Baier, then, proper moral decision making involves giving the best reasons in support of one course of action versus another.
A third area of moral psychology focuses on whether there is a distinctly female approach to ethics that is grounded in the psychological differences between men and women. Discussions of this issue focus on two claims: (1) traditional morality is male-centered, and (2) there is a unique female perspective of the world which can be shaped into a value theory. According to many feminist philosophers, traditional morality is male-centered since it is modeled after practices that have been traditionally male-dominated, such as acquiring property, engaging in business contracts, and governing societies. The rigid systems of rules required for trade and government were then taken as models for the creation of equally rigid systems of moral rules, such as lists of rights and duties. Women, by contrast, have traditionally had a nurturing role by raising children and overseeing domestic life. These tasks require less rule following, and more spontaneous and creative action. Using the woman’s experience as a model for moral theory, then, the basis of morality would be spontaneously caring for others as would be appropriate in each unique circumstance. On this model, the agent becomes part of the situation and acts caringly within that context. This stands in contrast with male-modeled morality where the agent is a mechanical actor who performs his required duty, but can remain distanced from and unaffected by the situation. A care-based approach to morality, as it is sometimes called, is offered by feminist ethicists as either a replacement for or a supplement to traditional male-modeled moral systems.
Normative ethics involves arriving at moral standards that regulate right and wrong conduct. In a sense, it is a search for an ideal litmus test of proper behavior. The Golden Rule is a classic example of a normative principle: We should do to others what we would want others to do to us. Since I do not want my neighbor to steal my car, then it is wrong for me to steal her car. Since I would want people to feed me if I was starving, then I should help feed starving people. Using this same reasoning, I can theoretically determine whether any possible action is right or wrong. So, based on the Golden Rule, it would also be wrong for me to lie to, harass, victimize, assault, or kill others. The Golden Rule is an example of a normative theory that establishes a single principle against which we judge all actions. Other normative theories focus on a set of foundational principles, or a set of good character traits.
The key assumption in normative ethics is that there is only one ultimate criterion of moral conduct, whether it is a single rule or a set of principles. Three strategies will be noted here: (1) virtue theories, (2) duty theories, and (3) consequentialist theories.
Many philosophers believe that morality consists of following precisely defined rules of conduct, such as “don’t kill,” or “don’t steal.” Presumably, I must learn these rules, and then make sure each of my actions live up to the rules. Virtue ethics, however, places less emphasis on learning rules, and instead stresses the importance of developing good habits of character, such as benevolence (see moral character). Once I’ve acquired benevolence, for example, I will then habitually act in a benevolent manner. Historically, virtue theory is one of the oldest normative traditions in Western philosophy, having its roots in ancient Greek civilization. Plato emphasized four virtues in particular, which were later called cardinal virtues: wisdom, courage, temperance and justice. Other important virtues are fortitude, generosity, self-respect, good temper, and sincerity. In addition to advocating good habits of character, virtue theorists hold that we should avoid acquiring bad character traits, or vices, such as cowardice, insensibility, injustice, and vanity. Virtue theory emphasizes moral education since virtuous character traits are developed in one’s youth. Adults, therefore, are responsible for instilling virtues in the young.
Aristotle argued that virtues are good habits that we acquire, which regulate our emotions. For example, in response to my natural feelings of fear, I should develop the virtue of courage which allows me to be firm when facing danger. Analyzing 11 specific virtues, Aristotle argued that most virtues fall at a mean between more extreme character traits. With courage, for example, if I do not have enough courage, I develop the disposition of cowardice, which is a vice. If I have too much courage I develop the disposition of rashness which is also a vice. According to Aristotle, it is not an easy task to find the perfect mean between extreme character traits. In fact, we need assistance from our reason to do this. After Aristotle, medieval theologians supplemented Greek lists of virtues with three Christian ones, or theological virtues: faith, hope, and charity. Interest in virtue theory continued through the middle ages and declined in the 19th century with the rise of alternative moral theories below. In the mid 20th century virtue theory received special attention from philosophers who believed that more recent ethical theories were misguided for focusing too heavily on rules and actions, rather than on virtuous character traits. Alasdaire MacIntyre (1984) defended the central role of virtues in moral theory and argued that virtues are grounded in and emerge from within social traditions.
Many of us feel that there are clear obligations we have as human beings, such as to care for our children, and to not commit murder. Duty theories base morality on specific, foundational principles of obligation. These theories are sometimes called deontological, from the Greek word deon, or duty, in view of the foundational nature of our duty or obligation. They are also sometimes called nonconsequentialist since these principles are obligatory, irrespective of the consequences that might follow from our actions. For example, it is wrong to not care for our children even if it results in some great benefit, such as financial savings. There are four central duty theories.
The first is that championed by 17th century German philosopher Samuel Pufendorf, who classified dozens of duties under three headings: duties to God, duties to oneself, and duties to others. Concerning our duties towards God, he argued that there are two kinds:
- a theoretical duty to know the existence and nature of God, and
- a practical duty to both inwardly and outwardly worship God.
Concerning our duties towards oneself, these are also of two sorts:
- duties of the soul, which involve developing one’s skills and talents, and
- duties of the body, which involve not harming our bodies, as we might through gluttony or drunkenness, and not killing oneself.
Concerning our duties towards others, Pufendorf divides these between absolute duties, which are universally binding on people, and conditional duties, which are the result of contracts between people. Absolute duties are of three sorts:
- avoid wronging others,
- treat people as equals, and
- promote the good of others.
Conditional duties involve various types of agreements, the principal one of which is the duty is to keep one’s promises.
A second duty-based approach to ethics is rights theory. Most generally, a “right” is a justified claim against another person’s behavior – such as my right to not be harmed by you (see also human rights). Rights and duties are related in such a way that the rights of one person implies the duties of another person. For example, if I have a right to payment of $10 by Smith, then Smith has a duty to pay me $10. This is called the correlativity of rights and duties. The most influential early account of rights theory is that of 17th century British philosopher John Locke, who argued that the laws of nature mandate that we should not harm anyone’s life, health, liberty or possessions. For Locke, these are our natural rights, given to us by God. Following Locke, the United States Declaration of Independence authored by Thomas Jefferson recognizes three foundational rights: life, liberty, and the pursuit of happiness. Jefferson and others rights theorists maintained that we deduce other more specific rights from these, including the rights of property, movement, speech, and religious expression. There are four features traditionally associated with moral rights. First, rights are natural insofar as they are not invented or created by governments. Second, they are universal insofar as they do not change from country to country. Third, they are equal in the sense that rights are the same for all people, irrespective of gender, race, or handicap. Fourth, they are inalienable which means that I cannot hand over my rights to another person, such as by selling myself into slavery.
A third duty-based theory is that by Kant, which emphasizes a single principle of duty. Influenced by Pufendorf, Kant agreed that we have moral duties to oneself and others, such as developing one’s talents, and keeping our promises to others. However, Kant argued that there is a more foundational principle of duty that encompasses our particular duties. It is a single, self-evident principle of reason that he calls the “categorical imperative.” A categorical imperative, he argued, is fundamentally different from hypothetical imperatives that hinge on some personal desire that we have, for example, “If you want to get a good job, then you ought to go to college.” By contrast, a categorical imperative simply mandates an action, irrespective of one’s personal desires, such as “You ought to do X.” Kant gives at least four versions of the categorical imperative, but one is especially direct: Treat people as an end, and never as a means to an end. That is, we should always treat people with dignity, and never use them as mere instruments. For Kant, we treat people as an end whenever our actions toward someone reflect the inherent value of that person. Donating to charity, for example, is morally correct since this acknowledges the inherent value of the recipient. By contrast, we treat someone as a means to an end whenever we treat that person as a tool to achieve something else. It is wrong, for example, to steal my neighbor’s car since I would be treating her as a means to my own happiness. The categorical imperative also regulates the morality of actions that affect us individually. Suicide, for example, would be wrong since I would be treating my life as a means to the alleviation of my misery. Kant believes that the morality of all actions can be determined by appealing to this single principle of duty.
A fourth and more recent duty-based theory is that by British philosopher W.D. Ross, which emphasizes prima facie duties. Like his 17th and 18th century counterparts, Ross argues that our duties are “part of the fundamental nature of the universe.” However, Ross’s list of duties is much shorter, which he believes reflects our actual moral convictions:
- Fidelity: the duty to keep promises
- Reparation: the duty to compensate others when we harm them
- Gratitude: the duty to thank those who help us
- Justice: the duty to recognize merit
- Beneficence: the duty to improve the conditions of others
- Self-improvement: the duty to improve our virtue and intelligence
- Nonmaleficence: the duty to not injure others
Ross recognizes that situations will arise when we must choose between two conflicting duties. In a classic example, suppose I borrow my neighbor’s gun and promise to return it when he asks for it. One day, in a fit of rage, my neighbor pounds on my door and asks for the gun so that he can take vengeance on someone. On the one hand, the duty of fidelity obligates me to return the gun; on the other hand, the duty of nonmaleficence obligates me to avoid injuring others and thus not return the gun. According to Ross, I will intuitively know which of these duties is my actual duty, and which is my apparent or prima facie duty. In this case, my duty of nonmaleficence emerges as my actual duty and I should not return the gun.
It is common for us to determine our moral responsibility by weighing the consequences of our actions. According to consequentialism, correct moral conduct is determined solely by a cost-benefit analysis of an action’s consequences:
Consequentialism: An action is morally right if the consequences of that action are more favorable than unfavorable.
Consequentialist normative principles require that we first tally both the good and bad consequences of an action. Second, we then determine whether the total good consequences outweigh the total bad consequences. If the good consequences are greater, then the action is morally proper. If the bad consequences are greater, then the action is morally improper. Consequentialist theories are sometimes called teleological theories, from the Greek word telos, or end, since the end result of the action is the sole determining factor of its morality.
Consequentialist theories became popular in the 18th century by philosophers who wanted a quick way to morally assess an action by appealing to experience, rather than by appealing to gut intuitions or long lists of questionable duties. In fact, the most attractive feature of consequentialism is that it appeals to publicly observable consequences of actions. Most versions of consequentialism are more precisely formulated than the general principle above. In particular, competing consequentialist theories specify which consequences for affected groups of people are relevant. Three subdivisions of consequentialism emerge:
- Ethical Egoism: an action is morally right if the consequences of that action are more favorable than unfavorable only to the agent performing the action.
- Ethical Altruism: an action is morally right if the consequences of that action are more favorable than unfavorable to everyone except the agent.
- Utilitarianism: an action is morally right if the consequences of that action are more favorable than unfavorable to everyone.
All three of these theories focus on the consequences of actions for different groups of people. But, like all normative theories, the above three theories are rivals of each other. They also yield different conclusions. Consider the following example. A woman was traveling through a developing country when she witnessed a car in front of her run off the road and roll over several times. She asked the hired driver to pull over to assist, but, to her surprise, the driver accelerated nervously past the scene. A few miles down the road the driver explained that in his country if someone assists an accident victim, then the police often hold the assisting person responsible for the accident itself. If the victim dies, then the assisting person could be held responsible for the death. The driver continued explaining that road accident victims are therefore usually left unattended and often die from exposure to the country’s harsh desert conditions. On the principle of ethical egoism, the woman in this illustration would only be concerned with the consequences of her attempted assistance as she would be affected. Clearly, the decision to drive on would be the morally proper choice. On the principle of ethical altruism, she would be concerned only with the consequences of her action as others are affected, particularly the accident victim. Tallying only those consequences reveals that assisting the victim would be the morally correct choice, irrespective of the negative consequences that result for her. On the principle of utilitarianism, she must consider the consequences for both herself and the victim. The outcome here is less clear, and the woman would need to precisely calculate the overall benefit versus disbenefit of her action.
Jeremy Bentham presented one of the earliest fully developed systems of utilitarianism. Two features of his theory are noteworty. First, Bentham proposed that we tally the consequences of each action we perform and thereby determine on a case by case basis whether an action is morally right or wrong. This aspect of Bentham’s theory is known as act-utilitiarianism. Second, Bentham also proposed that we tally the pleasure and pain which results from our actions. For Bentham, pleasure and pain are the only consequences that matter in determining whether our conduct is moral. This aspect of Bentham’s theory is known as hedonistic utilitarianism. Critics point out limitations in both of these aspects.
First, according to act-utilitarianism, it would be morally wrong to waste time on leisure activities such as watching television, since our time could be spent in ways that produced a greater social benefit, such as charity work. But prohibiting leisure activities doesn’t seem reasonable. More significantly, according to act-utilitarianism, specific acts of torture or slavery would be morally permissible if the social benefit of these actions outweighed the disbenefit. A revised version of utilitarianism called rule-utilitarianism addresses these problems. According to rule-utilitarianism, a behavioral code or rule is morally right if the consequences of adopting that rule are more favorable than unfavorable to everyone. Unlike act utilitarianism, which weighs the consequences of each particular action, rule-utilitarianism offers a litmus test only for the morality of moral rules, such as “stealing is wrong.” Adopting a rule against theft clearly has more favorable consequences than unfavorable consequences for everyone. The same is true for moral rules against lying or murdering. Rule-utilitarianism, then, offers a three-tiered method for judging conduct. A particular action, such as stealing my neighbor’s car, is judged wrong since it violates a moral rule against theft. In turn, the rule against theft is morally binding because adopting this rule produces favorable consequences for everyone. John Stuart Mill’s version of utilitarianism is rule-oriented.
Second, according to hedonistic utilitarianism, pleasurable consequences are the only factors that matter, morally speaking. This, though, seems too restrictive since it ignores other morally significant consequences that are not necessarily pleasing or painful. For example, acts which foster loyalty and friendship are valued, yet they are not always pleasing. In response to this problem, G.E. Moore proposed ideal utilitarianism, which involves tallying any consequence that we intuitively recognize as good or bad (and not simply as pleasurable or painful). Also, R.M. Hare proposed preference utilitarianism, which involves tallying any consequence that fulfills our preferences.
We have seen (in Section 1.b.i) that Hobbes was an advocate of the methaethical theory of psychological egoism—the view that all of our actions are selfishly motivated. Upon that foundation, Hobbes developed a normative theory known as social contract theory, which is a type of rule-ethical-egoism. According to Hobbes, for purely selfish reasons, the agent is better off living in a world with moral rules than one without moral rules. For without moral rules, we are subject to the whims of other people’s selfish interests. Our property, our families, and even our lives are at continual risk. Selfishness alone will therefore motivate each agent to adopt a basic set of rules which will allow for a civilized community. Not surprisingly, these rules would include prohibitions against lying, stealing and killing. However, these rules will ensure safety for each agent only if the rules are enforced. As selfish creatures, each of us would plunder our neighbors’ property once their guards were down. Each agent would then be at risk from his neighbor. Therefore, for selfish reasons alone, we devise a means of enforcing these rules: we create a policing agency which punishes us if we violate these rules.
Applied ethics is the branch of ethics which consists of the analysis of specific, controversial moral issues such as abortion, animal rights, or euthanasia. In recent years applied ethical issues have been subdivided into convenient groups such as medical ethics, business ethics, environmental ethics, and sexual ethics. Generally speaking, two features are necessary for an issue to be considered an “applied ethical issue.” First, the issue needs to be controversial in the sense that there are significant groups of people both for and against the issue at hand. The issue of drive-by shooting, for example, is not an applied ethical issue, since everyone agrees that this practice is grossly immoral. By contrast, the issue of gun control would be an applied ethical issue since there are significant groups of people both for and against gun control.
The second requirement for an issue to be an applied ethical issue is that it must be a distinctly moral issue. On any given day, the media presents us with an array of sensitive issues such as affirmative action policies, gays in the military, involuntary commitment of the mentally impaired, capitalistic versus socialistic business practices, public versus private health care systems, or energy conservation. Although all of these issues are controversial and have an important impact on society, they are not all moral issues. Some are only issues of social policy. The aim of social policy is to help make a given society run efficiently by devising conventions, such as traffic laws, tax laws, and zoning codes. Moral issues, by contrast, concern more universally obligatory practices, such as our duty to avoid lying, and are not confined to individual societies. Frequently, issues of social policy and morality overlap, as with murder which is both socially prohibited and immoral. However, the two groups of issues are often distinct. For example, many people would argue that sexual promiscuity is immoral, but may not feel that there should be social policies regulating sexual conduct, or laws punishing us for promiscuity. Similarly, some social policies forbid residents in certain neighborhoods from having yard sales. But, so long as the neighbors are not offended, there is nothing immoral in itself about a resident having a yard sale in one of these neighborhoods. Thus, to qualify as an applied ethical issue, the issue must be more than one of mere social policy: it must be morally relevant as well.
In theory, resolving particular applied ethical issues should be easy. With the issue of abortion, for example, we would simply determine its morality by consulting our normative principle of choice, such as act-utilitarianism. If a given abortion produces greater benefit than disbenefit, then, according to act-utilitarianism, it would be morally acceptable to have the abortion. Unfortunately, there are perhaps hundreds of rival normative principles from which to choose, many of which yield opposite conclusions. Thus, the stalemate in normative ethics between conflicting theories prevents us from using a single decisive procedure for determining the morality of a specific issue. The usual solution today to this stalemate is to consult several representative normative principles on a given issue and see where the weight of the evidence lies.
Arriving at a short list of representative normative principles is itself a challenging task. The principles selected must not be too narrowly focused, such as a version of act-egoism that might focus only on an action’s short-term benefit. The principles must also be seen as having merit by people on both sides of an applied ethical issue. For this reason, principles that appeal to duty to God are not usually cited since this would have no impact on a nonbeliever engaged in the debate. The following principles are the ones most commonly appealed to in applied ethical discussions:
- Personal benefit: acknowledge the extent to which an action produces beneficial consequences for the individual in question.
- Social benefit: acknowledge the extent to which an action produces beneficial consequences for society.
- Principle of benevolence: help those in need.
- Principle of paternalism: assist others in pursuing their best interests when they cannot do so themselves.
- Principle of harm: do not harm others.
- Principle of honesty: do not deceive others.
- Principle of lawfulness: do not violate the law.
- Principle of autonomy: acknowledge a person’s freedom over his/her actions or physical body.
- Principle of justice: acknowledge a person’s right to due process, fair compensation for harm done, and fair distribution of benefits.
- Rights: acknowledge a person’s rights to life, information, privacy, free expression, and safety.
The above principles represent a spectrum of traditional normative principles and are derived from both consequentialist and duty-based approaches. The first two principles, personal benefit and social benefit, are consequentialist since they appeal to the consequences of an action as it affects the individual or society. The remaining principles are duty-based. The principles of benevolence, paternalism, harm, honesty, and lawfulness are based on duties we have toward others. The principles of autonomy, justice, and the various rights are based on moral rights.
An example will help illustrate the function of these principles in an applied ethical discussion. In 1982, a couple from Bloomington, Indiana gave birth to a baby with severe mental and physical disabilities. Among other complications, the infant, known as Baby Doe, had its stomach disconnected from its throat and was thus unable to receive nourishment. Although this stomach deformity was correctable through surgery, the couple did not want to raise a severely disabled child and therefore chose to deny surgery, food, and water for the infant. Local courts supported the parents’ decision, and six days later Baby Doe died. Should corrective surgery have been performed for Baby Doe? Arguments in favor of corrective surgery derive from the infant’s right to life and the principle of paternalism which stipulates that we should pursue the best interests of others when they are incapable of doing so themselves. Arguments against corrective surgery derive from the personal and social disbenefit which would result from such surgery. If Baby Doe survived, its quality of life would have been poor and in any case it probably would have died at an early age. Also, from the parent’s perspective, Baby Doe’s survival would have been a significant emotional and financial burden. When examining both sides of the issue, the parents and the courts concluded that the arguments against surgery were stronger than the arguments for surgery. First, foregoing surgery appeared to be in the best interests of the infant, given the poor quality of life it would endure. Second, the status of Baby Doe’s right to life was not clear given the severity of the infant’s mental impairment. For, to possess moral rights, it takes more than merely having a human body: certain cognitive functions must also be present. The issue here involves what is often referred to as moral personhood, and is central to many applied ethical discussions.
As noted, there are many controversial issues discussed by ethicists today, some of which will be briefly mentioned here.
Biomedical ethics focuses on a range of issues which arise in clinical settings. Health care workers are in an unusual position of continually dealing with life and death situations. It is not surprising, then, that medical ethics issues are more extreme and diverse than other areas of applied ethics. Prenatal issues arise about the morality of surrogate mothering, genetic manipulation of fetuses, the status of unused frozen embryos, and abortion. Other issues arise about patient rights and physician’s responsibilities, such as the confidentiality of the patient’s records and the physician’s responsibility to tell the truth to dying patients. The AIDS crisis has raised the specific issues of the mandatory screening of all patients for AIDS, and whether physicians can refuse to treat AIDS patients. Additional issues concern medical experimentation on humans, the morality of involuntary commitment, and the rights of the mentally disabled. Finally, end of life issues arise about the morality of suicide, the justifiability of suicide intervention, physician assisted suicide, and euthanasia.
The field of business ethics examines moral controversies relating to the social responsibilities of capitalist business practices, the moral status of corporate entities, deceptive advertising, insider trading, basic employee rights, job discrimination, affirmative action, drug testing, and whistle blowing.
Issues in environmental ethics often overlaps with business and medical issues. These include the rights of animals, the morality of animal experimentation, preserving endangered species, pollution control, management of environmental resources, whether eco-systems are entitled to direct moral consideration, and our obligation to future generations.
Controversial issues of sexual morality include monogamy versus polygamy, sexual relations without love, homosexual relations, and extramarital affairs.
Finally, there are issues of social morality which examine capital punishment, nuclear war, gun control, the recreational use of drugs, welfare rights, and racism.
- Anscombe,Elizabeth “Modern Moral Philosophy,” Philosophy, 1958, Vol. 33, reprinted in her Ethics, Religion and Politics (Oxford: Blackwell, 1981).
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Last updated: May 10, 2009 | Originally published: June 29, 2003