Antoine Arnauld was considered by his peers as one of the preeminent 17th century European intellectuals. Arnauld had been remembered primarily as a correspondent of René Descartes, Gottfried Leibniz and Nicolas Malebranche, and as a dogmatic and uncritical Cartesian who made few if any philosophical contributions. In fact, as much newer research suggests, Arnauld was not a dogmatic and uncritical Cartesian, and he made many philosophical contributions over and above facilitating the development of the philosophical systems of Descartes, Leibniz and Malebranche.
Arnauld’s primary endeavors were largely theological. Indeed, the 18th Century Enlightenment thinker Voltaire wrote of Arnauld that “there was no one with a more philosophical mind, but his philosophy was corrupted” because, among other things, he “plunged 60 years in miserable disputes” (Voltaire 1906, p. 728/Kremer 1990, p. xi). In other words, Voltaire claims that Arnauld wasted his time on religious disputes and theology instead of focusing on philosophy. While it is controversial (to say the least) whether Arnauld’s primary intellectual endeavors were in fact “miserable disputes,” it is certainly true that Arnauld devoted the majority of his efforts and writings to theological and religious questions. Arnauld is likely the figure most associated with a sect of Catholicism prominent in France in the 17th Century called Jansenism (other than Cornelius Jansen for whom Jansenism is so named, see section 1).
However, despite his focus on theological and religious issues, Arnauld was a major figure in the philosophical landscape of the latter half of the 17th century. Arnauld burst onto the philosophical scene in 1641, when he authored the Fourth Objections to Descartes’ Meditations on First Philosophy. After Descartes had finished the manuscript of the Meditations, he sent it to Marin Mersenne to acquire comments from leading intellectuals of the day in Paris, including Thomas Hobbes and Pierre Gassendi. In the eyes of many (Descartes included), Arnauld’s are the best set of objections.
In the 1660’s Arnauld co-authored several philosophical works with others, none more influential and important than the Port-Royal Logic, sometimes called the Art of Thinking. In this work, Arnauld and co-author Pierre Nicole, offer a sophisticated account of reasoning well, which for these thinkers encompassed not just what we might associate with logic proper today, but also issues concerning the nature of ideas, metaphysics, philosophical methodology and ontology. Arnauld corresponded with Gottfried Leibniz in the 1680’s concerning an outline of what would later become one of Leibniz’s most influential works, the Discourse on Metaphysics. Arnauld also corresponded with Nicolas Malebranche in a very public controversy. In fact, this controversy has been called “one of the intellectual events of the [17th] century,” which covered, among other things the nature of ideas and the nature of God (Nadler 1996, p. 147). This article focuses on those texts and positions of Arnauld’s that are of the most philosophical interest.
Antoine Arnauld, often referred to as “le grand Arnauld” on account of his small physical stature, was first and foremost a theologian (Sedgwick 1998, p. 124). He was born on February 6th, 1612 into a well-regarded family in Paris. After briefly considering following his late father and pursuing a career in law, Arnauld decided, largely at the bequest of his mother and family friend (and friend of Cornelius Jansen) Jean Duvergier, to pursue a life in theology and the Church (Kremer 1990, pp. xiv; Nadler 1989, pp. 15-16). In 1633, Arnauld began his studies at the Sorbonne in Paris and both received his doctorate in theology and became an ordained priest in 1641. Arnauld would go on to ultimately serve on the faculty of the Sorbonne (Nadler 1989, p. 16).
Arnauld’s life was tied to Jansenism and the monastery of Port-Royal. Port-Royal was a convent in France that shifted between two locations (and sometimes both), one just outside of Paris and one in Paris – Port Royal du Champs and Port Royal de Paris respectively. (Sleigh 1990, pp. 26-27). The Port-Royal was associated with Jansenism and was dedicated to intellectual pursuits and notably the education of children (Sleigh 1990, p. 27).
Jansenism is a now defunct sect of Catholicism that sought reform within the Roman Catholic Church. Indeed, many of Jansenism’s critics argued that Jansenism was actually a brand of Protestantism and called the movement Jansenism to relate it to Calvinism, so named from John Calvin (Schmaltz 1999, p. 42). Jansenism developed out of the ideas of Cornelius Jansen and his book Augustinus. As the title suggests, Jansen defended an Augustinian inspired system. It is hard to outline many characteristics over and above being inspired by Jansen’s text and their views on grace that are representative of Jansenism or those associated with the Port-Royal (see, for example, Schmaltz 1999). For example, while the Port-Royal had long been associated with Cartesianism, recent research suggests that many associated with the Port-Royal were in fact anti-Cartesian (see, for example, Nadler 1988b). Nevertheless, the central claim of the Jansenist cause that occupies much of Arnauld’s attention at points in his career and plays a fundamental role in several of Arnauld’s most interesting philosophical contributions is the Augustinian doctrine of efficacious grace. This doctrine of efficacious grace held that one did not achieve salvation by one’s own merit, but only through the grace of God. Further, if one received God’s grace, one could not fail to achieve salvation. In other words, grace was given (or not given) by God and not earned by one’s own actions (Nadler 1989, p. 16 and Nadler 2008b, pp. 56-57). A second aspect of Jansenist doctrine (or at least Arnauld’s Jansenism) that plays a central role in Arnauld’s philosophical endeavors is a commitment to a “hidden God” (Moreau 2000, p. 106). By a “hidden God”, Arnauld at least, does not mean to claim that God’s works are unknowable or that we can know nothing about God, but rather that in some very substantive ways God is not fully comprehendible by us (see section 5).
Arnauld had a fundamental role in the “Quarrel over the Five Propositions”. In 1653, Pope Innocent X declared the following five propositions heretical. All five of these, the Pope claimed, were endorsed by Jansen in Augustinus:
Arnauld refused to submit to Papal authority and accept that Jansen’s text was heretical. While Arnauld granted that the Pope had the authority to decide what was or was not heretical, he denied that the Pope had a similar authority in interpreting Augustinus. In fact, Arnauld argued, Jansen endorses none of these propositions in Augustinus. This incident between the Pope and Jansenists like Arnauld, resulted in much persecution for Arnauld and other Jansenists and those who did not submit to Papal authority. Further, as a result of this incident, Arnauld was removed from the faculty of the Sorbonne in 1656 (Kremer 1990, pp. xv-xvi and Sleigh 1990, pp. 27-28). In 1679, Arnauld went into exile in the Netherlands, during which time he even used a fake name (Monsieur Davy) and never returned to France (Sleigh 1990, p. 26/Jacques 1976, p. 34]. Arnauld died August 8th 1694, in Liège.
[For more information on the life of Arnauld and from which the above account is taken, see especially: Nadler (1989) Chapter II; Kremer (1990); Sleigh (1990) Chapter 3; and Sedgwick (1998), especially Chapter 7. For a general book length-study of 17th Century French Jansenism, see Sedgwick (1977)].
In the course of his life, Arnauld wrote a substantial amount on both theology and philosophy. Those philosophical writings that are of the most importance are briefly discussed here.
While studying at the Sorbonne, Arnauld authored the aforementioned Fourth Objections to Descartes’ Meditations. In November of 1640, Descartes asked Marin Mersenne (who was the center of the Parisian intellectual world) to circulate copies of the Meditations among other thinkers in Paris to acquire comments and objections so that Descartes could publish them with the first printing of the Meditations. While the group of objectors included Pierre Gassendi, Thomas Hobbes and Marin Mersenne, Descartes claimed of Arnauld’s objections, “I think they are the best of all the sets of objections” (CSMK III 175/AT III 331). Arnauld’s objections to the Mediations have many distinctive features. For example, unlike the objections of Hobbes and Gassendi, Arnauld’s objections to the Meditations are not objections to Descartes’ system, but objections internal to Descartes’ system. Further, Arnauld’s objections resulted in changes in the actual body of the Meditations (see for example, Carraud 1995, pp. 110-111). Some of Arnauld’s objections are discussed below (section 2a). In addition to the Fourth Objections and Fourth Replies, Arnauld and Descartes exchanged two letters each in 1648 wherein Arnauld further presses Descartes on matters related to the Cartesian philosophy (although it is worth noting that Arnauld remained anonymous in these letters). These two letters are often called “The New Objections to Descartes’ Meditations” (and are available in English translation in Kremer’s translation of On True and False Ideas 1990). In these works, Arnauld pushes Descartes for further clarification of central aspects of the Cartesian worldview while simultaneously showing sympathy to that worldview.
Arnauld co-authored works with other Port-Royalists, two of which deserve special mention. The first of these is the Port-Royal Grammar. In this 1660 work Arnauld and co-author Claude Lancelot, construct a general text on grammar, which they define as “the art of speaking” (PRG 41/OA 41 5). They define speaking as “explaining one’s thoughts by signs which men have invented for that purpose” (PRG 41/OA 41 5). In 1662, Arnauld co-wrote a similar work called La Logique, ou L’art de Penser, that is The Logic or the Art of Thinking (henceforth: Logic) with Pierre Nicole. Arnauld and Nicole understand the purpose of logic to “give rules for all actions of the mind, and for simple ideas as well as for judgments and inferences” (B 15/OA 41 27). Thus, Arnauld and Nicole aim to produce a text based on reasoning well and making good judgments. Arnauld and Nicole divide the text into four parts: conceiving, judging, reasoning and ordering. Conceiving is “the simple view we have of things that present themselves to the mind” and is what we do when we represent things to the mind in the form of ideas before making judgments about them. Judging is the act of bringing together different ideas in the mind and affirming or denying one or the other. Reasoning is the “action of the mind in which it forms a judgment from several others.” Ordering (or method) is the mental action of arranging “ideas, judgments and reasonings” in such a way that the arrangement is “best suited for knowing the subject” (B 23/OA 41 125). The Logic is very influential. So influential, in fact, it has been claimed that “The Port-Royal Logic was the most influential logic from Aristotle to the end of the nineteenth century” (Buroker 1996, p. xxiii). Further, while the text is ostensibly one about logic, it also treats extensively metaphysics, philosophy of language, epistemology, theory of ideas and philosophy of religion.
Arnauld wrote a majority of his philosophical work while in exile. In Examen d’un Ecrit qui a pour titre: Traité de l’essence du the corps, et de l’union de l’âme avec le corps, contre la philosophie de M. Descartes, that is, an Examination of a Writing that has for a title: Treatise on the essence of the body, and the union of the soul with the body, against the philosophy of Mr. Descartes (henceforth Examen), Arnauld responds to an attack on Cartesianism by M. Le Moine, Dean of the Chapter of Vitre. The treaty to which Arnauld is responding is now lost (Schmaltz 2002, p. 54; Nadler 1989, p. 26, n 18). In this work, Arnauld defends a Cartesian philosophy, though not an entirely orthodox Cartesianism (see section 4). Arnauld divided the text into four sections: whether Descartes’ philosophy can add anything valuable over and above what scripture tells us; that Descartes’ philosophy is consistent with the Catholic stance on the Eucharist – a Catholic ceremony in which wine and bread are blessed by a priest and the wine and bread, which in the 17th century are taken to either be converted into, or annihilated and replaced by, Christ’s blood and body (see, for example, Nadler 1988, p. 230); that Descartes does not ruin the Church’s belief in the glory of the body; and on the union of the soul and the body. [For a thorough treatment of Arnauld, Descartes and the Eucharist, see Nadler (1988) and Schmaltz (2002), Chapter 1]. The Examen (1680) is especially notable as Arnauld was explicitly defending a Cartesian philosophy, even after Descartes’ works were condemned by the Congregation of the Index in 1663. To have one’s works condemned by the Congregation of the Index was having them being banned by the Catholic Church (see for example, Nadler 1988, p. 239).
In addition to the philosophical works described above, Arnauld participated in two events in the 17th century of immense importance, namely the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence and the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic. The most famous part of the correspondence with Leibniz (indeed the part normally referred to as the “Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence”) began in February of 1686 when Leibniz wrote to the Landgrave Ernst von Hessen-Rheinfels. Leibniz sent an outline of what would become one of Leibniz’s most important works, the Discourse on Metaphysics, and asked if the Landgrave could give the outline to Arnauld in hopes that Arnauld would comment on it. Arnauld and Leibniz then corresponded with Hessen-Rheinfels as an intermediary. Arnauld’s initial response to Leibniz gives some justification of his reputation as a harsh critic and hot-tempered person. Arnauld claims that Leibniz’s work contains “so many things that frighten me and that almost all men, if I am not mistaken, will find so shocking, that I do not see what use such a work can be, which will clearly be rejected by everybody” (M 9/G II 15). Arnauld adds “Would it not be better if he [Leibniz] abandoned these metaphysical speculations which cannot be of use to him or others, in order to apply himself seriously to the greatest business that he can ever have, the assurance of his salvation by returning to the Church” (M 10/G II 16). In Arnauld’s second letter to Leibniz, he apologizes and offers a more thorough account of what he found so troubling in Leibniz’s philosophy. It is this letter that begins a philosophical exchange whose rigor rivals the best published philosophical works of the period.
The correspondence had a profound effect on the development of Leibniz’s metaphysical system, so much so that Leibniz considered publishing the correspondence (G I 420, see also Sleigh 1990, p. 1). Further, as we shall see below, Arnauld offers some original contributions in the discussion, most notably concerning modal metaphysics or the nature of possibility. However, it is worth briefly noting two of Arnauld’s objections to Leibniz’s system before we move on. First, Arnauld objects to Leibniz’s account of pre-established harmony. In the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz defends pre-established harmony or as Arnauld refers to it “the hypothesis of the concomitance and harmony between substances” (M 78/G II 64). Leibniz’s view, in brief, is that each substance causes all of its own changes and there is no causation or causal relations between two distinct finite substances. Instead, according to Leibniz, God has set up the universe so that at the exact moment that, for example, Arnauld speaks to Leibniz, Leibniz’s own substance changes itself in such a way that Leibniz hears Arnauld. For example, in the Discourse Leibniz claims:
We could therefore say…that one particular substance never acts upon another particular substance nor is acted upon by it. (AG 47/G IV 358)
God alone (from whom all individuals emanate continually and who sees the universe not only as they see it but also entirely different from all of them) is the cause of the correspondence of their phenomena and makes that which is particular to one of them public to all of them; otherwise, there would be no interconnection. (AG 47/G IV 375)
Arnauld pushes Leibniz to clarify his view (M 78/G II 64) and then argues that Leibniz’s view collapses into a different account of causation prevalent in the 17th century: occasionalism (M 105-106/G II 84-85). The traditional doctrine of occasionalism, most closely associated with the Cartesian Nicolas Malebranche, is the conjunction of the following two claims:
According to occasionalism, only God has causal power. When it appears to us that a baseball breaks a window, it is not the case that the baseball (a finite thing) exercises any causal efficacy over the window. Instead, God, on the occasion of the baseball striking the window, causes the window to break. The baseball in this case is often called an “occasional cause”. However, one should not mistake an occasional cause as something with causal power, rather it simply signifies the occasion for God to exercise His causal power. Returning to Arnauld’s objection to Leibniz, he explains:
It seems to me that this [the concomitance and harmony between substances] is saying the same thing in other words as those who claim that my will is the occasional cause of the movement of my arm and God is the real cause. For they do not claim that God does that in time through a new act of will which he exercises each time I wish to raise my arm; but by that single act of the eternal will (M 105-106/G II 84).
Arnauld’s concern is that if substances are not causally affecting each other, and the correspondence of seeming causal relations occurs only because of God setting it up so that these relations correspond, how could this view be any different than claiming that only God is causally efficacious? We might restate Arnauld’s question as follows: Given that God wills things, not one at a time, but from a single eternal will, how is it any different for God to will from a single act of the eternal will that all ‘interactions’ between different substances correspond with no actual causal relations between them and for God to will the relations between the two substances themselves?
Arnauld may have misunderstood Leibniz in this regard [see, for example, Sleigh (1990), p. 150], as Leibniz would claim that each substance causes its own changes and insist that this is substantively different from occasionalism. However, Arnauld’s objections to Leibniz, at the least, push Leibniz to explain his view, and at best do not suffer from and rely on a misunderstanding of Leibniz’s position and offer a legitimate problem for Leibniz’s view.
Arnauld also criticizes Leibniz’s account substances. According to Leibniz, each created substance has a certain ‘form’ that constitutes its essence (see, for example, Sleigh 1990, p. 116). A full (or even adequate) account of Leibniz on this issue would take us on a long detour. For our purposes we can focus on one particular aspect of what Leibniz says:
If the body is a substance…[and not] an entity united by accident or by aggregation like a heap of stones, it cannot consist of extension, and one must necessarily conceive of something there that one calls a [form], and which corresponds in a way to a soul. (M 66/G II 58)
Take for example a human body. We naturally think of the human body, say Arnauld’s body, as an individual thing with some sort of unity or togetherness. According to Descartes and Arnauld (see section 2c) bodies are essentially extended things and are infinitely divisible. That is, for any body, that body can be divided into an infinite number of parts. Leibniz claims in this passage that if there are extended bodies they cannot be simply things like heaps of stone or simple aggregates. There must be something that unifies the body and this thing Leibniz says corresponds in a way to the soul. The “if” is quite important for Leibniz, for Leibniz seems to be acknowledging the possibility of physical substances being merely “true phenomenon like the rainbow” (see for example M 95/G II 77, Parkinson 1967, pp. xxvi-xxvii and Sleigh 1990, pp. 101-110). Leibniz’s comparison of the potential for physical substances being like a rainbow suggests that such substances might very well be nothing but phenomenon. Nevertheless, Leibniz denies that an extended substance could exist without some “form” providing it a unity.
Arnauld offers numerous arguments against Leibniz’s conception of “forms”. Indeed, as pointed out by Parkinson (1967, p. xxvi), Arnauld makes at least 7 distinct objections to this concept. Several of Arnauld’s objections include: denying that he has any clear notion of what such a “form” is (M 134/G II 107); that he only has knowledge of two types of substances, minds and bodies, and it does not make sense to call these “forms” minds or bodies (M 134-135/G II 107-108); and even that if these “forms” did exist, Leibniz’s account of them is indefensible (M 135/G II 108).
[For a general discussion of Arnauld and Leibniz’s discussion of “forms”, see Sleigh (1990), Chapter 6. For an excellent book-length treatment of the entire Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence see Sleigh (1990), and for a shorter treatment see Parkinson (1967)].
Arnauld also engaged in a decade long public dispute with Malebranche over the nature of ideas and account of God and God’s modus operandi. The debate between Arnauld and Malebranche should be interpreted as a debate between two Cartesians, who have strayed from the letter of Descartes in different ways. The public and private debate between Malebranche and Arnauld consists in many works and letters. The controversy began with Malebranche’s publication of the Treatise on Nature and Grace (henceforth: Treatise). Initially, prior to publication, Malebranche had sent the work to Arnauld for his opinion. However, Malebranche then decided to publish the Treatise without waiting to hear back from Arnauld. This event clearly irked Arnauld and is likely the beginning of the polemic (see Moreau 2000, p. 88 and OA 2 95, OA 2 101 and OA 2 116). In the Treatise, Malebranche offers a theodicy, or an attempt to reconcile the existence of an all-good, all-knowing, all-powerful God with the existence of evil. Prima facie, it seems that an all-powerful, all-good, all-knowing God could create a world with no evil (given all-power), would desire to create such a world (given all-goodness) and would know how to create such a world (given all-knowing). Malebranche offers a highly original theodicy. Malebranche’s theodicy and Arnauld’s objections are discussed in section 5b in regard to Arnauld’s conception of God and theodicy.
Arnauld vigorously responds to Malebranche’s view in print and then the two exchange numerous writings and compose many books arguing against each other for the next ten years (for an overview of the chronology of the debate, see Moreau 2000, pp. 88-92). Three of Arnauld’s works which are of much importance are On True and False Ideas (henceforth: VFI; from the French title: Des vraies et des fausses idées), Réflexions philosophiques et théologiques sur le noveau système de la nature et de la grace, that is, Philosophical and theological relfections on the new system of nature and grace (henceforth: Réflexions) and Dissertation sur la manière dont Dieu a fait les fréquents miracles de l’Ancienne Loi par le ministre des Anges, that is, Dissertation on the manner in which God has made frequent miracles of the Ancient Law by the minister of the Angles (henceforth: Dissertation). [Unfortunately, only the former is currently available in English and even it has only been available in English since 1990, see Kremer (1990), p. xii]. In the latter two, Arnauld goes after Malebranche’s theodicy and conception of God. VFI (1683) was Arnauld’s first contribution to the debate. Curiously, it does not address Malebranche theodicy or the Treatise (the work that started the polemic), but rather Arnauld offers an attack on Nicholas Malebranche’s The Search After Truth, specifically the theory of ideas there presented.
Malebranche offered a very distinct indirect realist theory of ideas. Malebranche’s account of ideas and perception is not always straightforward and not without its own interpretative issues. However, in brief, according to Malebranche, ideas are distinct things independent of the mind and objects that they represent. Further, when a person considers an idea, say of an extended body, the direct and immediate object of my thought is an idea, not the extended body itself. One only has indirect perception of the extended body. Malebranche also holds that these ideas are in an interesting sense “in God.” For Malebranche in human knowledge and perception the human mind perceives an idea and this idea is found in the divine understanding and is God’s idea [See, for example, The Search After Truth book III, part ii, chapters 1-7; PS 27-50 and Nadler (1992), pp. 98-99 from whom this account is indebted. For more elaborate discussions of Malebranche’s account of ideas, see Nadler (1992) and Schmaltz (2000)].
Arnauld vigorously opposed Malebranche’s account of ideas. It is clear that Arnauld argues against Malebranche’s view that there exist objects independent of our perception in God that play a role in our perception. Further, Steven Nadler (1989) has persuasively (although perhaps not definitely) argued that Arnauld was arguing against any indirect realist conception of ideas and instead offered an account in which ideas are modes of the mind and acts of perception such that the direct object of any perception is the thing which is perceived.
While the majority of the attention the Arnauld-Malebranche debate has received has concerned the theory of ideas, the majority of the debate has actually concerned theodicy and God. In the Réflexions and Dissertation, for example, Arnauld argues directly against Malebranche’s conception of God and theodicy, and Malebranche’s account of the order of providence.
This account of the correspondence brings us to an interesting question. While Arnauld’s main target was Malebranche’s theodicy and account of God’s modus operandi, Arnauld begins his attack on a seemingly unrelated issue, namely Malebranche’s theory of ideas. Why would Arnauld begin his attack on Malebranche’s theodicy with an attack on his theory of ideas? Recently, Denis Moreau has offered a very plausible explanation for this fact, an explanation that we will be in a position to consider in section 5b.
Though not addressed below, two other works that are related to the Arnauld-Malebranche debate that warrant mention are the Dissertatio Bipartitia, that is, Dissertation in Two Parts (1692), and Règle du bon sens, that is, the Rules of Good Sense (1693). The former was written by Arnauld in response to a work by Gommaire Huygens, in which Huygens defends a view similar to Malebranche’s concerning the theory of ideas (see TP 36). The latter was written in response to François Lamy, who at the request of Pierre Nicole (Arnauld’s co-author from the Logic), defended Huygens from Arnauld’s attack in the Dissertatio (see TP 37).
With this brief account of Arnauld’s life and works in hand, we can proceed to the heart of the project.
[For excellent treatments of the Arnauld-Malebranche polemic, see: Moreau (2000); and Nadler (1989). Moreau (2000) is an article length summary of the debate while Nadler (1989) is a book length treatment on the debate concerning ideas. In addition, Moreau (1999) is an excellent book-length treatment of the debate, though it is only available in French.]
In the Introduction it was claimed that it is a mistake to view Arnauld simply as an uncritical Cartesian, one who endorses Descartes’ positions and offers no critical evaluation, advancement or original contributions. Nevertheless, Arnauld’s philosophy was thoroughly Cartesian and his commitment to Cartesian is so fundamental to his philosophy that a section on Arnauld’s Cartesianism is in order. We begin with a discussion of the Fourth Objections as this is both one of Arnauld’s earliest philosophical works and involves Arnauld directly responding to Descartes’ Meditations. Then we proceed to discuss the nature of Arnauld’s Cartesianism and finally Arnauld’s commitment to a basic Cartesian ontology.
As discussed above, Arnauld was one of the authors of the Objections to Descartes’ Meditations. Arnauld’s objections, the Fourth Objections, include many objections that are of central importance, both philosophically and because they facilitate Descartes further articulating his own positions. Prior to receiving the manuscript of the Meditations from Mersenne, Arnauld was already familiar with and likely sympathetic to Cartesian philosophy. As he tells Mersenne:
You can hardly be after my opinion of the author, since you already know how highly I rate his outstanding intelligence and exceptional learning (CSM II 138/AT VII 197).
Arnauld was familiar with at least Descartes’ Discourse on Method (published in 1637) as he refers to it in the Fourth Objections (AT VII 199/CSM II 139). Returning to the philosophical content of the Fourth Objections, Arnauld offers many interesting and important objections to Descartes’ Meditations, all of which cannot be adequately covered here. Some of the most important ones are addressed below.
The first Arnauld’s objection to Descartes concerns the first argument in the Sixth Meditation for the claim that the mind and the body are really distinct (the one that occurs at AT VII 78/CSM II 54). Roughly, for the mind and body to be really distinct is for the mind to be able to exist without the body and for the body to be able to exist without the mind. Descartes begins the argument in question by claiming that:
(1) I know that everything which I clearly and distinctly understand is capable of being created by God so as to correspond exactly with my understanding of it (AT 78; CSM II 54).
And he continues:
(2) Hence the fact that I can clearly and distinctly understand one thing apart from another is enough to make me certain that the two things are distinct, since they are capable of being separated, at least by God (AT 78; CSM II 54).
And he concludes by claiming:
(3) On the one hand I have a clear and distinct idea of myself, in so far as I am simply a thinking, non-extended thing; and on the other hand I have a distinct idea of body, in so far as this is simply an extended, non-thinking thing (AT 78; CSM II 54).
So, he concludes:
(4) And accordingly, it is certain that I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it (AT 78; CSM II 54).
The correct interpretation of Descartes’ argument is controversial. However, fundamental to the argument is the inference from Descartes’ clear and distinct idea of himself (that is, whatever is essential to him) as a thinking, non-extended thing and his clear and distinct idea of body as an extended, non-thinking thing, to the claim that “I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it”. While Descartes does not give us an explicit definition of what a clear and distinct idea is in the Meditations (he does in the Principles of Philosophy, a text that was written later and so one which Arnauld would have not yet seen at the time of the Fourth Objections), Descartes clearly means an idea that has a certain internal feature such that it is very precise in his mind and strikes him with a certain strength. Descartes’ argument moves from our ability to have a clear and distinct idea of ourselves as thinking non-extended things to the “real distinction” of mind and body. Since we clearly and distinctly perceive that mind and body are separable, then minds and bodies are separable. Thus, central to Descartes’ argument is that our ability to clearly and distinctly conceive of mind and body as separate licenses the inference to the claim that minds and bodies are capable of being separate (or even of actually being separate). [For a more thorough account, see the Article titled “René Descartes: the Mind-Body Distinction” and for various different interpretations of Descartes’ argument see Van Cleve (1983); Wilson (1978); and Rozemond (1998)]
In his treatment of this argument, Arnauld questions the inference from our being able to clearly and distinctly conceive of mind and body as separate to their actually being separable. Arnauld offers what he takes to be a counter-example. He claims:
Suppose someone knows for certain that the angle in a semi-circle is a right angle, and hence that the triangle formed by this angle and the diameter of the circle is right angled. In spite of this, he may doubt, or not yet grasped as certain, that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides; indeed he may even deny this if he is misled by some fallacy. But now, if he uses the same argument as that proposed by our illustrious author, he may appear to have confirmation of his false belief, as follows: ‘I clearly and distinctly perceive’, he may say, ‘that the triangle is right-angled’; but I doubt that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides; therefore it does not belong to the essence of the triangle that the square on its hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other sides.’ (CSM II 141-142/AT VII 201-202)
Arnauld offers an objection to Descartes’ argument using what Arnauld takes to be a different case with an analogous structure. Arnauld thinks that in his case, the conclusion is clearly untenable and so Descartes’ argument must be mistaken. Arnauld argues that given Descartes’ argument it seems that it is possible for there to be a right triangle in which the square of the hypotenuse is not equal to the sum of the squares of the other two sides, in other words a right triangle that does not reflect Pythagoras’ Theorem. Arnauld argues: imagine someone considers a right triangle, but doubts whether the square of the hypotenuse is equal to the sum of the squares of the other two sides. Arnauld claims that using Descartes’ argument, since one clearly and distinctly conceives of a right triangle without recognizing that it instantiates Pythagoras’ Theorem, then one could conclude that a right triangle could exist that does not instantiate Pythagoras’ Theorem; a conclusion that is surely untenable.
Arnauld suggests that Descartes’ only reply is to claim that he does not clearly and distinctly perceive that the triangle is right angled. Arnauld continues: “But how is my perception of the nature of my mind any clearer than his perception of the nature of a triangle” (CSM II 142/AT VII 202). So, Arnauld suggests, either we can never know when we have a clear and distinct idea or Descartes’ principle suffers some counter-examples. Whether Arnauld’s objection is successful is a difficult question and one that cannot be covered here. However, briefly, it seems that Descartes’ reply to Arnauld is at least prima facie effective (and possibly a central text in offering a proper interpretation of Descartes’ argument). Descartes claims that “we can clearly and distinctly understand that a triangle in a semi-circle is right-angled without being aware that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides” and compares this to “clearly and distinctly perceive[ing] the mind without the body and the body without the mind” (CSM II 158/AT VII 224-225). Van Cleve (1983, p. 39) helpfully explains the difference (what occurs between the ‘ ’ is the content of the clear and distinct perception):
(a) Clearly and distinctly perceiving ‘A’ without clearly and distinctly perceiving ‘B’
(b) Clearly and distinctly perceiving ‘A without B’
So, it seems that Descartes is claiming in the case of mind and body that (b) holds. That is, we can have a clear and distinct perception with the content: “mind without body and body without mind”. In Arnauld’s cases, we only have a clear and distinct perception of a “right triangle” such that we fail to notice that it instantiates Pythagoras’ Theorem. In order for Arnauld’s case to be a true counter-example, we would need to be able to have a clear and distinct perception with the content “right triangle that does not instantiate Pythagoras’ Theorem” and Descartes would deny that we have any such perception.
Arnauld’s objection to Descartes seems to still be a central problem for conceivability-based accounts of the epistemology of modality (see, for example, Yablo 1993, p. 2). A conceivability-based account of the epistemology of modality is one in which our epistemic access to modal claims (that is, claims about possibility, essence, necessity, and so forth) are grounded in our faculty of conceiving of certain states of affairs. Indeed, the conceivability-possibility principle holds that if a state of affairs is conceivable, then it is possible. This principle seems ubiquitous in philosophy, not the least in many thought experiments. The problem akin to Arnauld’s objection is coming up with an internally verifiable criterion for the right sort of conceivability that does not admit of counter-examples. Interestingly, Arnauld ultimately would agree with Descartes and accept that clear and distinct perception was sufficient to establish a real distinction between mind and body (see for example, Schmaltz 1996, pp. 14). Arnauld’s objection to Descartes is of central importance, both historically and philosophically.
A second prominent objection from the Fourth Objections concerns the structure of the Meditations. Arnauld was the first to argue that Descartes’ argument in the Meditations is circular. Arnauld claims:
I have one further worry, namely how the author avoids reasoning in a circle when he says that we are sure that what we clearly and distinctly perceive is true only because God exists.
But we can be sure that God exists only because we clearly and distinctly perceive this. Hence, before we can be sure that God exists, we ought to be able to be sure that whatever we perceive clearly and evidently is true. (CSM II 150/AT VII 214)
The worry pointed to by Arnauld has become known as the ‘Cartesian Circle’. Arnauld asks, how can Descartes avoid arguing in a circle when, in the Meditations, he seems to both rely on a certain type of idea, namely clear and distinct ideas, to argue for God’s existence, while at the same time, using God to validate those clear and distinct ideas? In other words, Descartes’ proof for God’s existence depends on Descartes trusting his clear and distinct ideas and he relies on God to validate those clear and distinct ideas. It is possible, however, that there is no such circle in Descartes (indeed, Descartes’ response to Arnauld is key to understanding the Meditations and how Descartes does not argue in a circle). Nevertheless, there are passages that suggest that Descartes argues in a circle. For example, in the Fifth Mediation, Descartes claims: “if I were unaware of God…I should never have true and certain knowledge of anything, but only shifting and changeable opinions” (CSM II 48/AT VII 69). Regardless of one’s take on the Cartesian Circle, it is among the most well-known and oft-written about topics in Descartes scholarship and Arnauld was the first to articulate the worry.
Arnauld goes on to express a concern about Descartes’ dualism. This concern is motivated by the fact that Descartes argues that the mind and the body are entirely different sorts of substances, with nothing in common whatsoever. Arnauld worries that by exaggerating the distinction between the mind and body, Descartes renders the body an overly inconsequential part of our selves claiming “that man is merely a rational soul and the body merely a vehicle for the soul – a view which gives rise to the definition of a man as ‘a soul which makes use of a body’” (CSM II 143/AT VII 203). Arnauld is concerned, with this objection, to make sure that on Descartes’ account the human body is a legitimate whole.
As it has been noted above, Arnauld’s philosophy is clearly Cartesian. However, the extent to which he is a Cartesian is less clear. There are three general accounts of Arnauld’s commitment to Cartesianism. Traditionally, Arnauld had been interpreted as an uncritical and orthodox Cartesian (some readings go so far as to suggest that Arnauld treated Descartes as almost scripture). Marjorie Greene, for example, claims that Arnauld “would indeed prove for more than half a century the defender of pure Cartesian doctrine as he read it” (Grene 1998, p. 172). Other defenders of this general reading (although not as strong as Grene’s claim) include Robinet (1991) and Gouhier (1978). A second reading of Arnauld’s Cartesianism is that Arnauld was a Cartesian merely nominally. That is, the enthusiasm for Cartesian philosophy on the part of Arnauld was merely in so far as it furthered some other ends of Arnauld’s, whether it be to resuscitate interest in the philosophy of Augustine or to further some purely religious doctrines associated with Jansenism. Thus, although Arnauld may have furthered Cartesianism, developed Cartesianism and popularized Cartesianism, to call Arnauld a Cartesian is, in the words of Miel, “to be a dupe to a label” (Miel 1969, p. 262). Third, Arnauld can be seen as a critical and innovative Cartesian. That is, as a philosopher who embraced, to some extent, a Cartesian world-view, but remained critical of Descartes’ views and developed aspects of the Cartesian world-view or abandoned them when he saw fit. The most prominent defenders of this interpretation of Arnauld are Nadler (1995) and Moreau (1999); see also Kremer (1996) and Faye (2005). It seems that the best reading of Arnauld is the third reading. Indeed, the account of Arnauld defended in this article is indicative of the third reading to the extent that Arnauld strays from Descartes on several important issues described below. [For a good discussion of Arnauld’s Cartesianism, see Nadler (1989), Chapter II.]
Arnauld, like Descartes, has two exhaustive and exclusive dualisms at the foundation of his ontology, namely a substance-mode ontology and a mind-body substance dualism. Arnauld’s commitment to a substance-mode ontology is clear in Book I, Chapter 2 of the Logic, where he claims:
I call whatever is conceived as subsisting by itself and as the subject of everything conceived about it, a thing. It is otherwise called a substance.
I call a manner of a thing, or mode, or attribute, or quality, that which, conceived as in the thing and not able to subsist without it, determines it to be a certain way and causes it to be so named. (B 30/OA 41 46-47).
Arnauld is endorsing a substance-mode Cartesian ontology. Substances have two features. First, a substance is something which subsists by itself. Arnauld explains that by subsisting by itself, a substance needs “no other subject to exist” (B 31/OA 41 47). Arnauld holds that substances have independent ontic existence (relying only on God). The second feature of a substance is that it is the subject of everything conceived about it. That is, whatever features or properties the substance is conceived to have depend on the substance for their existence.
The second ontic category is that of modes. Modes cannot subsist on their own and are in a substance. In another passage Arnauld explains that modes “can exist naturally only through a substance” (Book I, Chapter 7, B 43/OA 41 64). Following Descartes, Arnauld defines modes as those things that rely on other things for their existence. Modes are different ways that substances can be (K 6/OA 38 184).
Arnauld, like Descartes, also endorses substance dualism, or the view that minds and bodies are the only two types of substances. That minds and bodies are the only two types of substances is a favorite example of Arnauld’s throughout the Logic. In Book 1, Chapter 7, he claims “body and mind are the two species of substance.” In Book II, Chapter 15, Arnauld claims “every substance is a body or a mind” (B 42/OA 41 61; B 123/OA 41 161). In fact, Arnauld tells Leibniz “I am acquainted with only two kinds of substances, bodies and minds; and it is up to those who would claim that there are others to prove it to us” (M 134/G II 107). Minds, for Arnauld, are essentially thinking things, while bodies are essentially extended things (see, for example, B 31-32/OA 41 135). In other words, what it is to be a mind just is to be a thinking thing and what it is to be a body just is to be an extended thing.
Another area of Arnauld’s philosophy that reveals his commitment to Cartesianism is his philosophical methodology. Two of the most illuminating discussions of Arnauld’s methodology occur throughout the Logic (especially Book IV) and the early chapters of VFI.
In Book IV of the Logic, Arnauld lists four rules useful for guarding against error when we try to find the truth in human sciences (L1, for Logic 1, and so forth):
L1. Never accept anything as true that is not known evidently to be so.
L2. Divide each of the difficulties being presented into as many parts as possible, and as may be required to solve them.
L3. To proceed by ordering our thoughts, beginning with the simplest and the most easily known objects, in order to rise step by step, as if by degrees, to knowledge of the most complex, assuming an order even among those that do not precede one another naturally.
L4. Always make enumerations so complete and reviews so comprehensive that we can be sure to leave nothing out. (B 238/OA 41 367-368) In Chapter I of VFI, Arnauld offers seven “rules which we ought to keep in mind in order to seek the truth” (K 3/OA 38 181).
The rules are (V1 for VFI 1, and so forth):
V1. The first is to begin with the simplest and clearest things, such that we cannot doubt about them provided that we pay attention to them.
V2. The second, to not muddy what we know clearly by introducing confused notions in the attempt to explain it further.
V3. The third is not to seek for reasons ad infinitum; but to stop when we know what belongs to the nature of the thing, or at least to be a certain quality of it.
V4. The fourth is not to ask for definitions of terms which are clear in themselves, and which we could only render more obscure by trying to define them, because we could explicate them only by those less clear.
V5. The fifth is not to confuse the questions which ought to be answered by giving the formal cause, with those that ought to be answered by giving the efficient cause, and not to seek the formal cause of the formal cause, which is a source of many errors, but rather to reply at that point by giving the efficient cause.
V6. The sixth is to take care not to think of minds as being like bodies or bodies as being like minds, attributing to one what pertains to the other.
V7. The seventh, not to multiply beings without necessity. (K 3-4/OA 38 181-182)
Later in VFI, Arnauld adds some “axioms” that compliment and/or add to his method. These axioms include (the axiom numbers as listed here do not correspond with the numbers as listed in VFI, A1 for Axiom 1, and so forth):
A1. Nothing should make us doubt something if we know that it is so with entire certainty, no matter what difficulties can be put forward against it.
A2. Nothing is more certain than our knowledge of what takes place in our soul when we pause there. It is very certain, for example, that I conceive of bodies when I think I conceive of bodies, even though it may not be certain that the bodies that I conceive either truly exist, or are such as I conceive them to be.
A3. It is certain, either by reason, assuming that God is not a deceiver, or at least by faith, that I have a body and that the earth, the sun, the moon and many other bodies which I know as existing outside of my mind, truly exist outside my mind.
There is much of interest in this set of rules. One aspect that is immediately noticeable is how similar and indebted to Descartes these rules are. Although it would be beyond the scope of this article to offer a full investigation and comparison of Arnauld’s method to Descartes’, there are a few aspects of the relation that are worth noting. Rules L1-L4 are taken from Descartes’ Discourse on Method and identified as such by Arnauld and Nicole. In the Discourse on Method, Descartes offers his method “of rightly conducting one’s reason and seeking truth in the sciences” (CSM I 111/AT VI 1). In the Discourse, Descartes is openly critical of the education (although certainly not entirely dismissive) he received while studying at one of the better schools in Europe at the time. Descartes offers his own rules as a replacement for the method he had been taught (CSM I 120/AT VI 18-19). Descartes is often considered the “Father of Modern Philosophy” and this title is not without merit, at least in part because of his method. Arnauld’s explicit endorsement of the method offered by Descartes in the Discourse on Method shows Arnauld’s embrace of the new method in philosophy.
The rules from VFI are very similar to those from Descartes’ Rules for the Direction of the Mind (henceforth: Rules; CSM I 9-78/AT X 359-472). For example, V1 above is very similar (if not simply a restatement) of Rule 5 of Descartes’ Rules, where Descartes claims that we should “reduce complicated and obscure propositions step by step to simple ones, and then, starting with the intuition of the simplest ones of all try to ascend through the same steps to knowledge of all the rest” (Nadler 1989, p. 34 makes this point). V1 is an explicit mention of Descartes’ Method of Doubt (the method Descartes uses in the Meditations), as Arnauld wants to rely on things that we cannot doubt in his method. In V2, Arnauld warns of not introducing confused notions to understand what we already know clearly. It is further noteworthy that in his explanation of Rule 4, Arnauld explicitly mentions Descartes.
In V6, Arnauld claims that one must be very clear to distinguish between bodies and minds and not attribute what belongs to one to the other. For example, Arnauld would argue that thought pertains to minds and extension belongs to body. It is a mistake to think of bodies as thinking or minds as extended. In V7, Arnauld endorses what is often called Ockham’s Razor, or the principle that one ought not introduce things into one’s ontology when there is no need to do so. This is no doubt in the background of Arnauld’s dismissal of Leibniz’s “forms” discussed in section 1c. Arnauld thinks not only that these forms are vague, but also that they are unhelpful and unnecessary.
In the axioms from VFI, specifically A1, Arnauld claims that “nothing should make us doubt something if we know it with entire certainty” even if this leads to other difficulties. Arnauld employs this principle often in the Logic. For example, in the Logic, Arnauld claims:
How to understand that the smallest bit of matter is infinitely divisible and that one can never arrive at a part that is so small that not only does it not contain several others, but that it does not contain an infinity of parts; that the smallest grain of wheat contains in itself as many parts, although proportionately smaller, as the entire world…all these things are inconceivable, and yet they must necessarily be true, since the infinite divisibility of matter has been demonstrated. (B 231/OA 41 359)
Here Arnauld applies A1 to the claim that matter is infinitely divisible. Arnauld takes it that it has been proven that matter is infinitely divisible. Yet, it is inconceivable how this is so. We should not doubt this, however, no matter what difficulties are put forward concerning it. This is because it has been demonstrated. Arnauld goes on to relate this same principle to God and God’s omnipotence:
The benefit we can derive from these speculations is not just to acquire this kind of knowledge [extension’s being infinitely divisible]…but to teach us to recognize the limits of the mind, and to make us admit in spite of ourselves that some things exist even though we cannot understand them. This is why it is good to tire the mind on these subtleties, in order to master its presumption and to take away its audacity ever to oppose our feeble insight to the truths presented by the Church, under the pretext that we cannot understand them. For since all the vigor of the human mind is forced to succumb to the smallest atom of matter, and to admit that it clearly sees that it is infinitely divisible without being able to understand how that can be, is it not obviously to sin against reason to refuse to believe the marvelous effects of God’s omnipotence, which is itself incomprehensible, for the reason that the mind cannot understand them. (B 233/OA 41 361).
Here, Arnauld claims that God’s omnipotence and it effects are incomprehensible, yet this should not cause of to doubt that God is omnipotent. We shall return to this point in section 5a.
[See Nadler (1989), Chapter II.3 for a great discussion of the methodology and its relation to Cartesianism].
One of the key questions facing Cartesian dualism is how the mind and body, being so radically different, could causally interact. While there is some debate about the exact nature of Descartes’ position, the dominant reading is that he held mind-body interactionism—the view that the mind and body causally interact with one another. As discussed in section 2c, Arnauld also held mind-body substance dualism. It is not surprising then that Arnauld inherited some of the same questions concerning interaction from Descartes. There is also debate about Arnauld’s view in this respect, and whether Arnauld followed Descartes and embraced interactionism or abandoned interactionism in favor of a version of occasionalism.
As discussed in section 1c, the traditional doctrine of occasionalism has two components:
Arnauld clearly rejects both 1 and 2. Arnauld holds that finite minds have causal power. Thus, it may seem odd to attribute occasionalism to Arnauld. However, consider the following two claims:@
The conjunction of 3 and 4, or mind-body occasionalism, is occasionalism with respect to only a certain type of causal relations, namely mind-body causal relations.
The traditional reading of Arnauld is as a mind-body interactionist. The most sophisticated defense of this reading is A. R. Ndiaye’s. He argues that despite his occasionalist vernacular, Arnauld is in the tradition of Descartes, not in the occasionalist tradition (Ndiaye 1991, p. 308).
While Ndiaye’s interpretation deserves treatment, Nadler (1995) has convincingly argued that, at least by the end of his career, Arnauld was a mind-body occasionalist (the following account is taken from Nadler 1995). As pointed out by Nadler, in the Examen Arnauld argues that mental states and bodily states correspond in an interesting way. We have certain mental states, like pain, on the occasion of certain bodily states, like burning flesh. Arnauld argues that such a correspondence needs an explanation; that is, Arnauld claims that there must be some reason for this correlation between certain types of bodily events and certain types of mental states. Arnauld suggests only three possible explanations:
(a) Bodies cause mental states.
(b) The mind causes its own mental states on the occasion of certain bodily states.
(c) God causes mental states on the occasion of certain physical states.
The three options Arnauld gives make perfect sense given Arnauld’s mind-body substance dualism. The only created substances that exist are minds and bodies and of course God exists as well. Given that these are the only things that exist, the three above options seem to be the only three possibilities to explain the correspondence between mental states and bodily states (short of coincidence). Either minds are responsible, bodies are responsible or God is responsible. Arnauld begins by denying that bodies cause mental states, arguing:
For the movement of a body can have at most no other real effect than to move another body, I say at most, for possibly it cannot even do that, for who does not see that a body cannot at all have causal relations with a spiritual soul [qui ne voit qu’il n’en peut causer aucun sur une ame spirituelle] which is incapable, by its nature, of being pushed or moved? (E 99/OA 38 146)
Arnauld clearly denies that bodies can exercise causal power over minds. Thus, Arnauld has eliminated the first possibility. Arnauld then proceeds to consider the second possibility and claims that the mind does not cause its own perception on the occasion of certain bodily states, for the mind could not “ha[ve] such a power to give itself all the perceptions of sensible objects” to “produce them so properly and with so marvelous a promptitude” (OA 38 147/E 101/trans. Nadler 1995, p. 135). In other words, the human mind cannot cause the correct sensations so consistently and so unerringly. How would the human mind know what sensations to cause and when? Since Arnauld argues there are only three possibilities (namely a, b and c above) and the first two do not work (namely, a and b), it must be that God causes them:
It only remains for us to understand that it must be that God desired to oblige himself to cause in our soul all the perceptions of sensible qualities every time certain motions occur in the sense organs, according to the laws that he himself has established in nature (emphasis mine, E 101-102/OA 38 147-148; translation Nadler 1995, p. 136).
Arnauld’s account, at least with respect to body→mind causal relations is occasionalist. God causes our mental states on the occasion of certain bodily states every time these bodily states occur.
As pointed out by Nadler, there is another work in which Arnauld does address mind→body causal relations, namely the Dissertation. In the Dissertation, Arnauld claims:
Our soul does not know what needs to be done to move our arm…it is properly only this reason…that can lead one to believe that it is not our soul that moves our arm. (OA 38 690/trans. Nadler 1995, pp. 138-139)
This is not an argument for occasionalism, as all Arnauld claims is that finite minds do not causally affect bodies. However, Arnauld has only three options open to explain the correspondence of mental states and physical states: finite minds, bodies or God. Bodies certainly do not have the capacity to recognize what to do on the occasion of states of the soul. Minds do not have the requisite knowledge to produce their own perceptions on the occasion of certain bodily states, so a fortiori, bodies would not have such a capacity (see Nadler 1995, p. 138). Thus, given that Arnauld denies that finite minds causally affect bodies, the only option available to explain the correspondence is God.
These passages illustrate Arnauld’s commitment to mind-body occasionalism. In fact, they illustrate that Arnauld’s mind-body occasionalism is an ad hoc response to some form of the problem of interaction (see Nadler 1995, pp. 142-143). Arnauld argues that it is clear that minds do not causally affect bodies and that bodies do not causally affect minds, so God must be responsible for the causal interaction.
Concerning body-body causation, Arnauld is less clear in his position. Nadler has suggested that Arnauld seems to allow body-body causal relations. Indeed, he cites the passage: “For the movement of a body can have at most no other real effect than to move another body” to suggest that Arnauld seems to hold that bodies do have causal power (Nadler 1995, p. 132). However, Arnauld follows this claim up with “I say at most, for possibly it cannot even do that.” There appears to be no text that establishes Arnaud’s view on the matter, but the hesitation in this passage may suggest that Arnauld was not completely satisfied with the possibility of body-body causal relations and at least would entertain the notion that body-body causal relations were occasionalist.
[Secondary literature: Ndiaye (1991); Watson (1987); Robinet (1991); Nadler (1995); Kremer (1996); Sleigh (1990).]
As noted in the introduction, Arnauld was primarily a theologian. Combining Arnauld’s focus on theological issues and his philosophical acumen, one might expect that Arnauld had especially interesting philosophical discussions and views pertaining to God, God’s modus operandi and theodicy. If so, one would not be disappointed. Two questions concerning Arnauld’s views on God are of particular importance. First, did Arnauld follow Descartes and endorse the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths. Second, what contributions, if any, did Arnauld make to the problem of theodicy and an account of God’s modus operandi.
One of the most contested issues in Arnauld scholarship is whether Arnauld followed Descartes in endorsing the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths (henceforth: CET). Descartes first defends this position in a series of letters to Mersenne in 1630. For example, Descartes claims:
You ask me by what kind of causality God established the eternal truths. I reply: by the same kind of causality as he created all things, that is to say, as their efficient and total cause. For it is certain that he is the author of the essence of created things no less than their existence; and the essence is nothing other than the eternal truths…You ask what necessitated God to create these truths; and I reply that he was free to make it not true that all the radii of the circle are equal – just as free as he was not to create the world. And it is certain that these truths are no more necessarily attached to his essence than are other created things. You ask what God did in order to produce them. I reply that from all eternity he willed and understood them to be, and by that very fact he created them…In God, willing, understanding and creating are all the same thing without one being prior to the other even conceptually. (AT 1 152-153/CSMK III 25-26)
How to interpret CET is a difficult question in its own right. Eternal truths are truths like those of mathematics, for example, 2+2=4, and those about essences, for example, Descartes is a thinking thing. These sorts of truths are usually considered to be necessarily true. That is, they are considered to be truths that could not have been false. Yet, in this passage, Descartes seems to suggest that the eternal truths were created by God in such a way that they could have been false. There are many different interpretations of Descartes’ account of CET, three of which are especially worth noting. On one reading of CET, popularized by Frankfurt (1977), to claim that God freely created the eternal truths is to claim that all truths, even the eternal truths, are contingent. A second interpretation, popularized by Curley, holds that Descartes is not denying that the eternal truths are necessary, but rather that they are necessarily necessary (Curley 1984). Finally, a third interpretation, defended by Kaufman, holds that Descartes’ claim that God freely created the eternal truths is simply to claim that there were no factors, independent of God that compelled God to create the eternal truths as they were in fact created. Kaufman argues, however, that this is consistent with these truths being necessarily true (Kaufman 2002, p. 38). What is central to the doctrine on all three readings is that there is a legitimate sense in which God was free in creating the eternal truths and had the capacity to create them differently (or at least to not create them).
While Arnauld never explicitly addresses CET, whether he endorses it is the focus of much Arnauld scholarship. Interpretations vary from Andrew Robinet’s claim that “Arnauld offers a tranquil Cartesianism, which is not confused by the eternal truths” (Robinet 1991, p. 8), to Nadler’s suggestion that (depending on one’s interpretation of Descartes) Arnauld could be “seen as going further than Descartes, recognizing the truly radical potential of the Cartesian doctrine [CET] and embracing it” (Nadler 2008, p. 536), to Emmanuel Faye’s interpretation that “Arnauld’s doctrinal position” concerning the creation of the eternal truths “is not Cartesian but Thomist, even if it is, in actuality, a nuanced Thomism” (Faye 2005, p. 208), to Tad Schmaltz’s claim that “Arnauld never did take a stand on [the creation of the eternal truths]” (Schmaltz 2002, pp. 15-16).
Before discussing whether Arnauld adopted CET, three other views about God that Arnauld endorses should be addressed, namely the Principle of Divine Incomprehensibility (PDI), the Doctrine of Equivocity and the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity. All three of these views are held by Descartes (although they are not necessarily unique to Cartesianism, and attributing the Doctrine of Equivocity to Descartes is controversial). Further, all three views are relevant to Descartes’ acceptance of CET and to Arnauld’s account of God.
The Principle of Divine Incomprehensibility is the thesis that:
PDI: (a) We ought to believe everything that is revealed by God.
(b) The fact that we cannot understand how something revealed by God can come about should not deter us from believing it because a finite intelligence ought not to expect to understand the nature or causal power of an infinite being. (Kremer 1996, p. 84)
In the Examen Arnauld directly endorses PDI:
Whatever God has been pleased to reveal to us about himself or about the extraordinary effects of his omnipotence ought to take first place in our belief even though we cannot conceive it, for it is not strange that our mind, being finite, cannot comprehend what an infinite power is capable of. (OA 38, 90/E 12/trans. Kremer 1996, p. 77)
In this passage Arnauld explicitly defends both components of PDI. We should believe everything revealed to us by God and we should believe it even if we cannot understand it because we ought not expect our finite intellect to be able to understand the infinite. In fact, Arnauld holds a view stronger than PDI, claiming that things God reveals to us ought to be placed first in our beliefs (see Kremer 1996, p. 88 fn. 5). Arnauld’s claim here is without doubt related to axiom A1 and his discussion of God and God’s omnipotence from section 3. Arnauld takes it that we know that God is omnipotent and that we should believe everything revealed to us by God even if we cannot understand how it can be true.
Arnauld also endorses the Doctrine of Equivocity or the thesis that predicates when applied to God and finite things have at most equivocal meanings and not at all univocal meanings. That is, to say that God is powerful and to say that Alexander the Great is powerful are to say entirely different things about God and Alexander the Great. In this context, “powerful” means something entirely different when applied to God and when applied to Alexander the Great. Properties that are possessed by God and by finite things, are at best equivocally similar properties. At the conclusion of a discussion about the Eucharist (see section 1b) and its relation to Cartesian philosophy in the Examen, Arnauld adds:
But I add before finishing…nothing would be more unreasonable than to hold that philosophers, who have the right to follow the light of reason in the human sciences, are required to take what is incomprehensible in the mystery of the Incarnation as a rule for their opinion when they attempt to explain the natural union of the soul with the body, as if the soul could do with regard to the body what the eternal Word could do with regard to the humanity he took on, even though the power, as will as the wisdom, of the eternal Word is infinite, while the power of the soul over the body to which it is joined is very limited. We would not have those thoughts which mix up everything in philosophy and theology, if we were more convinced of the clear and certain maxim that Cardinal Bellarmine used against the quibbles of the Socinians: “No inference can be made from the finite to the infinite,” or as others put it “there is no proportion [proportio] between the finite and the infinite”. (OA 38 175/E 141, trans. Carraud 1996, p. 9)
In this passage, Arnauld is defending the Doctrine of Equivocity. Arnauld cites as a “clear and certain maxim” that no inference can be made from the finite to the infinite, and considers it the same claim as there being “no proportion [proportio] between the finite and the infinite.” While attributing the Doctrine of Equivocity to Arnauld is controversial, to claim that there is no proportio (“proportion”, while most naturally translated “proportion” can also mean “analogy” or “symmetry”) between the finite and the infinite is at least prima facie to claim that properties of God and created things are in no way similar. [See, Nadler (2008), p. 533 and Carraud (1995), pp. 122-123 for a discussion of equivocity in Arnauld]. At the very least, Arnauld flatly denies the claim that predicates apply to God and creatures univocally. For properties to apply to God and creatures univocally is for those properties to be essentially the same kind of properties. Although God is infinite and creatures finite, according to the Doctrine of Univocity, what it is for God to have knowledge and for creatures to have knowledge is roughly the same (see Nadler 2008b, pp. 204-207 and Moreau 2000, p. 104).
Arnauld also endorses the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity, or the view that God is absolutely simple. For Arnauld, to claim that God is simple is, among other things, to deny any real distinction between God’s will, God’s understanding and God. God’s will and understanding are one and the same thing; God’s will just is God’s understanding. In addition, Arnauld’s version of divine simplicity is such that it is not the case that God’s will and understanding performing different functions in God’s action and creation. While the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity was ubiquitous among Arnauld’s contemporaries and predecessors, many seem to not require this latter claim as a component in divine simplicity. Arnauld’s account of divine simplicity appears both in the correspondence with Leibniz and the debate with Malebranche. In the latter, for example, Arnauld offers this account of divine simplicity while arguing against Malebranche’s conception of God. In discussing God’s creation, Malebranche describes God as “consulting his wisdom.” In the Treatise Malebranche explains: “The wisdom of God reveals to him an infinity of ideas of different works, and all the possible ways of executing his plans” (OC 5 28/R116; for a nice summary of Malebranche’s theodicy, see Rutherford 2000). Thus, Malebranche has an account where God consults his understanding, considers the many different ways that he could create, and selects one.
Arnauld objects to this conception of God and God’s action in many ways. For example, Arnauld claims it is not appropriate to say that God: “’consults his wisdom’, and it is from there that it happens that all that He wills is wise.” For, Arnauld claims, God does not need to consult his wisdom in order to be wise, “everything that he wills” is “essentially wise as soon as he wills it” (OA 39 578/Nadler 2008, p. 531). Arnauld further claims that: “Can there be a thought more unworthy of God than to imagine such a disagreement between his wisdom and his will as if his will and his wisdom were not the same thing?” (OA 39 748/Moreau 2000, p. 103, trans. Nadler). In these passages, Arnauld is articulating his conception of God such that God’s different faculties do not play different roles in creation; God is absolutely simple. [See also Nelson (1993), pp. 685-688; Moreau (1999), especially pp. 280-286; Moreau (2000), especially section 4.3, pp. 102-104; and Nadler (2008), p. 533, for discussion of Arnauld and divine simplicity]
There is strong evidence that Arnauld endorsed the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity, Equivocity and PDI. In fact, it seems the text demands that Arnauld held divine simplicity and PDI and at least strongly supported the Doctrine of Equivocity. Returning to whether Arnauld also adopted the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths, the dominant view is that Arnauld denied CET (see for example Kremer 1996, Gouhier 1978, and Robinet 1991). Carraud (1996) and Schmaltz (2002) have argued either that Arnauld never made up his mind, or at least that the texts give us no answer. Faye argues that what is “created” about the eternal truths is not that they depend on the free decrees of God. Rather, the eternal truths are created on account of the fact that the truth is known by the human intellect, which is a created intellect (Faye 2005, pp. 206-207). Moreau (1999) has offered a very compelling case that Arnauld did in fact accept CET that is endorsed (and developed) by Nadler (2009). While this is too difficult a question to adequately answer here, what is clear is that Arnauld holds the same underlying conception of God (for example, strong notion of divine simplicity, Equivocity and PDI) that Descartes relies on in his exposition of and defense of CET and his conception of God at least approaches the Cartesian God (see Nadler 2009, p. 533). Arnauld explicitly claims in his account of PDI that we cannot understand the causal power of an infinite being and in his defense of Equivocity argues that finite beings and God have no proportion to another. Finally, in his account of divine simplicity, Arnauld denies that God understands conceptually prior to God’s willing certain states of affairs. Given PDI it seems that Arnauld would at least not positively claim that there are things that God cannot do (for example, make 2+3=6) and given Equivocity and divine simplicity it seems that Arnauld would not conceive of God creating in the way that Malebranche and Leibniz, for example, would hold, namely by understanding all the possible ways of creating conceptually prior to willing to create. In the Logic (see section 3), Arnauld denies that we can understand God’s omnipotence. Put all of these aspects of Arnauld’s conception of God together and it seems that Arnauld’s conception of God at least approaches CET.
Arnauld’s most systematic contributions to the question of theodicy come in his criticisms of Malebranche’s theodicy. As such, it will be beneficial to first briefly examine Malebranche’s theodicy before considering Arnauld’s response and account. Malebranche begins by citing two features of an infinitely perfect being: a wisdom that has no limits and a power that nothing is capable of resisting (R 116/OC V 27). Malebranche’s God surveys all of the possible universes that God could create and chooses to create the one that is the best reflection of God’s attributes. Malebranche claims:
An excellent workman should proportion his action to his work; he does not accomplish by quite complex means that which he can execute by simpler ones; he does not act without an end, and never makes useless efforts. From this one must conclude that God, discovering in the infinite treasure of his wisdom an infinity of possible worlds (as the necessary consequences of the laws of motion which he can establish), determines himself to create that world which could have been produced and preserved by the simplest laws, and ought to be the most perfect, with respect to the simplicity of the ways necessary to its production or to its conservation. (R/OC V 28)
The aim in God’s creation of the world is not to create the world with the least amount of evil, but the world that is the best reflection of God and God’s attributes. God, being infinitely wise, ought to create a world that is produced and preserved by the simplest laws. God acts, as Malebranche likes to say, nearly always by ‘general volitions’ and very rarely by ‘particular volitions’. When confronted with evil in the world, God did not will that that evil exist by a particular volition, but only as a consequence of the general laws that God has willed due to their simplicity, that is, by a general volition. Malebranche goes so far as to say that “God’s wisdom in a sense renders Him impotent; for since it obliges Him to act by the most simple ways, it is not possible for all humans to be saved” (OC 5 47, trans. Nadler 2008, p. 525).
Many things about Malebranche’s theodicy upset Arnauld. Only several of Arnauld’s more prominent objections shall be discussed here. First and foremost, Arnauld objects to Malebranche’s theodicy because it limits God’s power. Arnauld was very adamant in his defense of divine power, so much so that he even criticizes Descartes, whose divine voluntarism is well-known, of limiting God’s power. In the New Objections to Descartes’ Meditations, Arnauld argues concerning Descartes’ claim that a vacuum is impossible: “I would rather acknowledge my ignorance than convince myself that God necessarily conserves all bodies, or at least that he cannot annihilate any one of them unless he at once creates another” (K 188/OA 38 75). Arnauld’s insistence on a strong conception of divine omnipotence continued throughout his career. He was critical of Malebranche’s theodicy because, he thought, it limits God’s power substantially. In the Reflexions, for example, Arnauld objects to Malebranche’s claim that God must choose the world with the simplest laws. In passages pointed out by Moreau (2000, p. 103), Arnauld claims of Malebranche’s theodicy and account of God’s action: “it is indeed strange that someone should so easily take the liberty to provide arbitrary boundaries to the freedom of God” and “He fears not to set limits to the freedom of God…He fears not to proclaim that…God will have no freedom in his choice of ways necessary for the execution of his designs…but on what basis could a doctrine so injurious to divine freedom be grounded?” (OA 39 603 and OA 39 594-595/both translations are Nadler’s and appear in Moreau 2000, p. 103). Overall, not only does this language undermine God’s omnipotence, but also humanizes his ways of acting. Arnauld claims: “All means for executing his designs are equally easy for God…and his power so renders him master of all things and so independent of the need for help from others, that it suffices that he will for his volitions to be executed” (OA 39 189-190/trans. Nadler 1996, p. 154, who points to this passage). Arnauld objects to Malebranche’s theodicy because he sees it as putting unnecessary and inappropriate constraints on God’s action and power
Arnauld also objects to Malebranche’s theodicy because Malebranche admits that evil exists in the world. According to Malebranche, there are legitimate evils in the world and these evils are allowed to exist by God. In fact, as noted above Malebranche is an occasionalist. Thus, it seems that God is causally responsible for evil. Arnauld, on the other hand, rejects this claim, insisting that apparent evils in the world are only appearances. Arnauld claims God’s work has no faults: “There are no faults in the works of God.” According to Arnauld, if we “consider the whole” world, or perhaps better, were we able to consider the whole, we would recognize that everything contributes to the overall beauty of the universe (OA 39 205/see also Nadler 1996, p. 156 who points to this passage).
Finally, Arnauld attacked Malebranche’s claim that God acts primarily by “general volitions” and very rarely by “particular volitions”. In a section of Malebranche’s Treatise added in a later addition to clarify the distinction (no doubt from Arnauld’s very objections), Malebranche defines what it means for God to act by a general volition and by a particular volition.
I say that God acts by general volitions, when he acts in consequence of general laws which he has established. For example, I say that God acts in me by general volitions when he makes me feel pain at the time I am pricked; because in consequence of the general and efficacious laws of the union of the soul and the body which he has established, he makes me feel pain when my body is ill-disposed. (R 195/OC V 147, I have replaced Riley’s “wills” with “volitions” for the French “volontez”)
I say on the contrary that God acts by particular volitions when the efficacy of his volition is not determined at all by some general law to produce some effect. Thus, supposing that God makes me feel the pain of pinching without there happening in my body, or in any creature whatsoever, any changes which determine him to act in me according to general laws—I say then that God acts by particular volitions. (R 195/OC V 147-148, I have replaced “wills” and “will” with “volitions” and “volition”, respectively for the French “volontez” and “volonté”)
Arnauld argues that Malebranche’s claim that God acts almost always by general wills destroys God’s providential concern for creation. According to Arnauld, God acts according to general laws, but does not act by general laws (see, for example, OA 39 175). Arnauld argues that in fact, God has a volition for every state of affairs in the world. Arnauld’s objection relies on interpreting Malebranche’s account of God’s acting by general volitions as one in which the contents of God general volitions are general laws. For example, on this reading the content of God’s volition might be “For all created substances x and y and for every time t1, if x is G at t1 and x bears relation R to y then there is a time t2 such that t2 bears relation T to t1 and y is F at t2” (this example is taken from Black 1997, p. 34). Thus on this reading, general volitions have contents which are laws. It is not clear that Arnauld interpreted Malebranche correctly in this regard. Indeed, a second plausible interpretation of Malebranche is that when Malebranche claims that God acts by general volitions, Malebranche means that God has particular content volitions in accordance with the natural laws (see Pessin 2001, for this very helpful way of explaining the distinction). So, Malebranche’s God would have a volitional content for every particular state of affairs of the world, but God’s volitional contents proceed according to general laws. If this latter reading is correct, then Arnauld’s objection seems to lack force as Malebranche does claim of God that God acts through general laws and not by general laws. What is clear is that Arnauld holds that God has a volitional content of every particular state of affairs of the world.
[For discussions of the correct interpretation of Malebranche in this respect see: Pessin (2001); Nadler (2000); Black (1997); and Stencil (2011)]
If we combine the discussion of Arnauld’s commitments to his understanding of God from the two above discussions, we can see a distinction conception of God emerge. First and foremost, is Arnauld’s insistence that God (an infinite being) does not act in the way that created finite beings act. God’s understanding and will do not play different roles in creation or in God’s action. The necessity to consult one’s understanding before willing, having to balance different competing desires and not being able to achieve all of one’s ends is something that finite beings do, but not God. God is in this sense not a being with practical rationality (see for example, Nadler 2008, p. 518). Second, God created no evil (at least as a positive thing in the world). If we were capable of understanding creation in its entirety we would see that everything contributes to the greatness and beauty of the universe. And finally, from Arnauld’s objections to Malebranche’s theodicy, we can see that Arnauld holds that although God acts according to general laws, God does not act by general laws. God directly acts in every particular situation.
Before moving on, we are now finally in a position to consider Moreau’s suggestion as to why Arnauld begins his attack on Malebranche’s theodicy with an attack on Malebranche’s theory of ideas. From Arnauld’s perspective, Malebranche’s theory of ideas, especially his Vision in God doctrine and his theodicy are quite related. According to his Vision in God doctrine, created beings have ideas that are in a sense in God and Malebranche’s God acts much like created beings do, for example, by consulting his understanding. As Moreau (2000, pp. 104-106) argues, Arnauld sees both of these as an illegitimate understanding of God and endorsement of the Doctrine of Univocity. God has ideas that are in a sense accessible to us and acts in much the same way we do, according to Malebranche. These are both problematic for Arnauld, as he denies univocity between God and created beings. Indeed, if the above account is correct, he endorses equivocity.
In the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence, Arnauld not only offers many important objections to Leibniz’s view (some of which were outlined in section 1), but he also offers a positive account of modality. The best way to approach Arnauld’s account is to consider one more of his objections to Leibniz.
Arnauld’s initial objection in his first letter revolves around Leibniz’s endorsement of the Complete Concept Theory of Substance (CCS). As Leibniz explains in the outline sent to Arnauld:
Since the individual concept of each person contains once for all everything that will ever happen to him, one sees in it a priori proofs or reasons for the truth of each event, or why one event has occurred rather than another. (M 5/G II 12)
Leibniz defends this view in the Discourse on Metaphysics:
We are able to say that this is the nature of an individual substance or of a complete being, namely, to afford a conception so complete that the concept shall be sufficient for the understanding of it and for the deduction of all the predicates of which the substance is or may become the subject. (D 13/G IV 349/AG 41)
CCS is the view that it is the nature of an individual substance to have a complete concept such that any true predication which can be made of that substance is contained in that substance’s concept. According to this view, not only is being a man contained in the concept of Caesar, but also that he crossed the Rubicon, that he was the subject of a biography by Plutarch and every other particular event in his life.
Arnauld adamantly objects to this principle:
If that is so, God was free to create or not create Adam; but supposing he wished to create him, everything that has happened since and will ever happen to the human race was and is obliged to happen through a more than fatal necessity. For the individual concept of Adam contained the consequence that he would have so many children, and the individual concept of each of these children, everything that they would do and all the children they would have: and so on. There is therefore no more liberty in God regarding all that, supposing he wished to create Adam, than in maintaining that God was free, supposing he wished to create me, not to create a nature capable of thought. (M 9/G II 15)
As with many of his objections to Malebranche, Arnauld is concerned that Leibniz’s view limits God’s power. Arnauld argues that once God has decided to create Adam, everything else that happens follows through necessity. This is because what is contained in Adam’s complete concept entails every other fact about the universe. For example, Adam’s complete concept entails not only that Caesar exist, but that Plutarch compose a treatise on Caesar. The reason is, or at least Arnauld seems to take it, that it is a true predication of Adam that Adam exists a certain number of years before Caesar. Since this is a true predication of Adam, and a complete concept of Adam (according to Leibniz) is sufficient to deduce all of Adam’s predicates; Caesar is either a part of Adam’s concept or straightaway follows from Adam’s concept. Arnauld finds this troubling. Not the least because he sees it as a threat to God’s omnipotence. Once God creates Adam, Arnauld claims, God is bound to create Caesar and everything else that God creates through a “more than fatal necessity.” Surely, Arnauld would claim, God could have created Adam and chosen not to create Caesar, or at least God could have created Caesar and Plutarch, but Plutarch wrote a biography on Aristotle instead. Arnauld treats this as an unacceptable limitation on God’s power.
Leibniz responds, and among other things, offers his account of creation. Leibniz sums up the relevant part of his account of creation in the Monadology: “There is an infinity of possible universes in God’s ideas, and since only one of them can exist, there must be a sufficient reason for God’s choice which determines him towards one thing rather than another” (AG 220/G IV 615-616). Much like Malebranche, Leibniz considers that God’s creation takes place by God considering the possible ways that God could create. God’s decision to create is not piecemeal, as Leibniz claims: “one must not consider God’s will to create a particular Adam separate from all the others which he has regarding Adam’s children and the whole of the human race” (M 14/G IV 19). Leibniz continues that had God wanted to create a world with “Adam” and a different posterity, God would have created a different Adam with a different complete concept. Leibniz holds that God created in the best possible way from an infinite number of options. In these infinite different universes that God could create, there are many different “Adams” and in some of those worlds there are “Caesars” and in some there are not.
Ultimately, Arnauld concedes to Leibniz’s account of a complete concept, but the concession is only a terminological one. It turns out the real debate between the two is about the nature of possibility. As Arnauld tells Leibniz:
It was more than enough to make me decide to confess to you in good faith that I am satisfied by the way you explain what had at first shocked me regarding the concept of an individual nature…I see no other difficulties remaining except on the possibility of things, and this way of conceiving of God as having chosen the universe that he has created amongst an infinite number of other possible universes that he saw at the same time and did not wish to create. But as that strictly has no bearing upon the concept of the individual nature and since I should have to ponder too long to make clear what my views on the subject are, or rather what I take exception to in the ideas of others, because they do not seem to me to be worthy of God, you will think it advisable, Sir, that I say nothing about it. (M 77/G II 64)
As convincingly argued by Alan Nelson (1993), the debate between Leibniz and Arnauld is a debate between a possibilist (Leibniz) and an actualist (Arnauld). Possibilism is the view that there is an ontic distinction between two types of existing things: actual things and possible things. Actualism is the view that the only things that exist are actual things. According to Leibniz, prior to the creation of the universe, God considers all of the possible universe that God could create and chooses the best of those worlds and creates it. The world that God creates is the actual world. In addition to the actual world, there are an infinite number of merely possible worlds, which exist but only in God’s mind. In the above passage Arnauld offers his disagreement with this way of conceiving of God’s creating: “I see no other difficulties remaining except on…this way of conceiving of God as having chosen the universe that he has created amongst an infinite number of other possible universes.” Nelson (1993, p. 686) has helpfully suggested keeping Arnauld’s endorsement of the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity in mind in this passage. As argued in the section 5a, Arnauld held a view of divine simplicity such that God’s different faculties do not play different roles in God’s acting. Leibniz’s God, given that he surveys his understanding prior (at least conceptually) to his willing to create, has faculties participating in God’s action in different ways. This Arnauld sees as an unacceptable way to conceive of God and so there are no possible worlds in God’s mind that are not created.
After Arnauld objects to Leibniz’s account of creation and the existence of possible worlds in God’s understanding on account of its reliance on a view whereby God’s understanding and will are distinct (see M 27-33/G II 28-33), Arnauld then offers an actualist account:
I confess in good faith that I have no conception of these purely possible substances, that is to say, the ones that God will never create. And I am very much inclined to think that they are figments of the imagination that we create, and that what we call possible, purely possible, substances, cannot be anything other than God’s omnipotence, which being a pure act does not permit the existence in it of any possibility [et que tout ce que nous appelons substances possibles, purement possibles, ne peut être autre chose que la toute-puissance de Dieu, qui étant un pur acte ne souffre point qu’il y ait en lui aucune possibilité]. (M 31/G II 31-32)
But one can conceive of possibilities in the natures which [God] has created…as I can also do with an infinite number of modifications which are in the power of these created natures, such as the thoughts of intelligent natures and the forms of extended substance. (M 31-32/G I 32, see also Nelson 1993, p. 685 who points to this passage)
The view suggested by Arnauld is that all that exists are God and actual substances and all possibility exists in virtue of the modal properties or “powers” of actually existing substances. Prior to God’s creation, there are no ‘possible worlds’ in God’s understanding from which God chooses to create. Instead, God creates all actual things and possibility is grounded in these actual things and their powers. For example, Arnauld would claim, it is possible for Descartes to have written 7 meditations, instead of 6. This is not because God could have chosen to create a Descartes who wrote 7 meditations, but because it is in the power of the actually created Descartes that he could have written a 7th meditation.
Antoine Arnauld was a major figure in the intellectual landscape of the latter part of the 17th century. Although he has not received the attention that others have, for example, Descartes, Leibniz and Spinoza, Arnauld is finally starting to receive the attention he so rightly deserves from scholars. Arnauld was arguably the most philosophically gifted Cartesian of the latter part of the 17th century and explicitly defended Cartesianism even after Descartes’ works had been put on the index. His Objections to Descartes’ Meditations are arguably the best of any set. He went on to co-author an extremely influential logic text with Pierre Nicole. His correspondence with Leibniz, where he simultaneously pushes Leibniz to explain his position, offers insightful criticisms of Leibniz’s views and offers his own philosophical contributions is one of the most sophisticated and philosophically interesting texts of the period. And finally, Arnauld was a major player in one of the most important intellectual events of the 17th century, the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic that resulted in many works from both parties. There is much of interest in Arnauld that scholars are just beginning to investigate. While at least one major barrier to Arnauld’s acquiring more attention in the English-speaking world is the lack of English translation of many of his major texts, Arnauld scholarship will no doubt continue to become more prominent and Arnauld will finally receive the attention deserved of one of his influence and acumen.
Utah Valley University
U. S. A.
Last updated: February 17, 2013 | Originally published: