Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Plato: The Academy

greek_vasePhilosophical institution founded by Plato, which advocated skepticism in succeeding generations.

The Academy (Academia) was originally a public garden or grove in the suburbs of Athens, about six stadia from the city, named from Academus or Hecademus, who left it to the citizens for gymnastics (Paus. i. 29). It was surrounded with a wall by Hipparchus, adorned with statues, temples, and sepulchres of illustrious men; planted with olive and plane trees, and watered by the Cephisus. The olive-trees, according to Athenian fables, were reared from layers taken from the sacred olive in the Erechtheum, and afforded the oil given as a prize to victors at the Panathenean festival. The Academy suffered severely during the siege of Athens by Sylla, many trees being cut down to supply timber for machines of war.Few retreats could be more favorable to philosophy and the Muses. Within this enclosure Plato possessed, as part of his patrimony, a small garden, in which he opened a school for the reception of those inclined to attend his instructions. Hence arose the Academic sect, and hence the term Academy has descended to our times. The nameAcademia is frequently used in philosophical writings, especially in Cicero, as indicative of the Academic sect.

Sextus Empiricus enumerates five divisions of the followers of Plato. He makes Plato founder of the first Academy, Aresilaus of the second, Carneades of the third, Philo and Charmides of the fourth, Antiochus of the fifth. Cicero recognizes only two Academies, the Old and the New, and makes the latter commence as above with Arcesilaus. In enumerating those of the old Academy, he begins, not with Plato, but Democritus, and gives them in the following order: Democritus, Anaxagoras, Empedocles, Parmenides, Xenophanes, Socrates, Plato, Speusippus, Xenocrates, Polemo, Crates, and Crantor. In the New, or Younger, he mentions Arcesilaus, Lacydes, Evander, Hegesinus, Carneades, Clitomachus, and Philo (Acad. Quaest. iv. 5). If we follow the distinction laid down by Diogenes, and alluded to above, the Old Academy will consist of those followers of Plato who taught the doctrine of their master without mixture or corruption; the Middle will embrace those who, by certain innovations in the manner of philosophizing, in some measure receded from the Platonic system without entirely deserting it; while the New will begin with those who relinquished the more questionable tenets of Arcesilaus, and restored, in come measure, the declining reputation of the Platonic school.

Views of the New Academy. The New Academy begins with Carnades (i.e. the Third Academy for Diogenes) and was largely skeptical in its teachings. They denied the possibility of aiming at absolute truth or at any certain criterion of truth. Carneades argued that if there were any such criterion it must exist in reason or sensation or conception; but as reason depends on conception and this in turn on sensation, and as we have no means of deciding whether our sensations really correspond to the objects that produce them, the basis of all knowledge is always uncertain. Hence, all that we can attain to is a high degree of probability, which we must accept as the nearest possible approximation to the truth. The New Academy teaching represents the spirit of an age when religion was decaying, and philosophy itself, losing its earnest and serious spirit, was becoming merely a vehicle for rhetoric and dialectical ingenuity. Cicero’s speculative philosophy was in the main in accord with the teachings of Carneades, looking rather to the probable (illud probabile) than to certain truth (see hisĀ Academica).

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Last updated: April 9, 2001 | Originally published: