In 18th and 19th century Scottish common sense philosophy, the term “active powers” refers to the capacities of impulse and desire which lead to or determine human action. It is distinguished from intellectual powers which involve the capacities of reasoning, judging and conceiving.
The distinction is derived from Aristotle’s analysis of the capacities or powers of living beings into nutrition, appetite, perception, movement, and reason. Of these, reason is held to be peculiar to humans. However, in humans, appetite (including desire, sensuous impulse, and will) partakes of reason in the sense of being able to obey it. For Aristotle, the distinction between moral and intellectual virtues rests on the distinction between appetitive and purely rational functions of humans. Aristotle’s fivefold distinction of powers was adopted by Aquinas, but he discussed in detail only the intellectual and appetitive powers – the latter including desire and will.
Thomas Reid gave currency to this dual division in the late 18th century, especially in his two books Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (1785) and Essays on the Active Powers of Man(1788). Under the heading of “active powers” Reid further distinguished the will from principles of action, the latter of which included (1) mechanical principles of instinct and habit, (2) animal principles such as appetite and desire, (3) and rational principles such as duty and rectitude.
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