Jane Addams was an activist and prolific writer in the American Pragmatist tradition who became a nationally recognized leader of Progressivism in the United States as well as an internationally renowned peace advocate. Addams is primarily acclaimed for founding the Chicago social settlement, Hull-House, which emerged as the flagship of the Settlement Movement. Hull-House provided Addams with a supportive intellectual community and a basis for understanding urban life amidst rapid immigrant influx. Together with other Hull-House residents, Addams undertook a number of local, state, national and ultimately international activist projects including garbage collection, adult education, child labor reform, labor union support, women’s suffrage and peace advocacy among others. Her personal accomplishments are staggering and are recounted in a number of contemporary biographies. Addams helped to found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People, the American Civil Liberties Union and the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom. In 1931, she was awarded the Nobel Peace Prize.
Addams’ achievements as a social reformer represent a prodigious legacy but she also left a significant intellectual heritage. She authored a dozen books and over 500 articles of original social philosophy as recognized by her contemporaries including John Dewey, William James, and George Herbert Mead. The organizing principle of her social philosophy was progress. To this end, Addams understood democracy as both a form of socially engaged living and as a framework for social morality. Accordingly, authentic social advancement should be democratic or what she termed “lateral progress,” an inclusive advancement not just narrowly applied to the privileged. Addams argued that fostering the moral relations necessary for a robust democracy required community members to engage in “sympathetic knowledge,” an approach to learning about one another for the purpose of caring and acting on one another’s behalf. Addams’ writings emphasize direct experience, pluralism and fallibility in the engagement with concrete social issues. Although the works of male philosophers such as Dewey, Peirce, James and Mead dominate the literature of classic American pragmatism, the writings of Jane Addams provide a unique and provocative feminist pragmatist voice.
Laura Jane Addams was born on September 6, 1860 in Cedarville, Illinois, ten months after the publication of Darwin’s Origin of The Species, two months prior to the election of Abraham Lincoln to the presidency of the United States and seven months prior to the secession of the South from the Union. Addams recounts her early life in Twenty Years at Hull-House, the only one of her works to continuously remain in print since it was first published in 1910. As a child she was called “Jennie” but her childhood had a turbulent beginning. When Jennie was two, her mother, Sarah, died whilst giving birth to her ninth child. As a result, Addams formed a significant bond with her father, John, who was a successful mill owner and politician. John Addams corresponded with Lincoln, and Jane Addams associated her father and Lincoln as moral icons and personal inspirations throughout her life. The relationship between John and his daughter was important because it afforded Jane the attention of an educated and worldly adult, an opportunity not experienced by many young women of this era. John Addams remarried but there was always a special bond between Jane and he.
John Addams sent his daughter to college at the Rockford Female Seminary (later Rockford College). Although Addams was always a good student, she blossomed in college and became a widely acknowledged campus leader. Addams learned how valuable a supportive female community could be given women’s exclusion from most activities in the public sphere. She later replicated the woman-centered atmosphere at Hull-House. When Addams graduated from college in 1881, she intended to pursue a medical career, but after a short tine in graduate school, she decided that medicine was not in her future. The death of her father in that same year placed her life in turmoil. Having lost direction in her life, she fell into a decade-long phase of soul searching, combined with sporadic health problems. During this period she undertook several trips to Europe. On her second trip, she encountered the pioneering social settlement, Toynbee Hall in London. Toynbee Hall provided young men an opportunity to work to improve the lives of impoverished Londoners. Soon after this encounter Addams developed a plan to start a social settlement in the United States.
Addams enlisted the help of her friend Ellen Gates Starr in her noble scheme. Starr had briefly attended Rockford College with Addams, so they shared an understanding of the empowerment that a female community could provide to its residents. Addams and Starr open the Hull-House settlement in 1889 in the heart of a run-down neighborhood on the west side of Chicago. They began with few plans, few resources and few residents but with a desire to be good neighbors to the community. Working with the network of women’s organizations in Chicago, the number of Hull-House projects quickly grew, as did their reputation. Women, and to a lesser extent men, came from all over the country to live and work as part of this progressive experiment in communal living combined with social activism. Under Addams’ leadership, Hull-House opened a public bathhouse, undertook a campaign to have the garbage collected, started a kindergarten, developed the first playground in Chicago and responded to a variety of community needs. At first, Addams had rented the entire second floor and the first floor drawing room of the Hull-House building but eventually the settlement complex grew to accommodate one full city block. Addams faced an ongoing challenge to explain the work Hull-House had undertaken. People often felt compelled to give settlement projects the familiar label of charity work, but Addams rebuffed this claim. As she explained in her 1893 article, “The Objective Value of the Social Settlement,” Addams viewed Hull-House residents as engaged in reciprocal knowledge work: the collection, analysis and dissemination of information combined with intelligent action.
Addams was an effective activist and organizer but she was also keenly attuned to social theory. As a child she had read widely, largely influenced by her father who housed the town library in their home. At Rockford, she was exposed to Ancient Greek philosophy as well as the social theories of the Romantics, John Ruskin and Thomas Carlyle. At Hull-House, Addams attracted the attention of John Dewey, William James and George Herbert Mead, each of whom visited and engaged Addams in lively conversations that proved to be mutually influencing. Given this intellectual foundation, Addams used her Hull-House experience as a springboard for developing public philosophy in the American Pragmatist Tradition. In 1899, ten years after founding Hull-House, Addams published, “The Function of the Social Settlement” in which she placed her progressive activities in epistemological terms. Addams viewed issues of knowledge as the most profound contemporary challenge. Social settlements were an active effort to learn about one another across class and cultural divides thus building collective knowledge about the individuals who make up this diverse society. In this manner, Hull-House served as a multi-directional conduit of information about human lives: Addams and her cohorts helped immigrants learn how to navigate the complex American culture while Addams communicated and thematized her experience with immigrants to help white, upper and middle class America understand what it meant to be poor and displaced. Furthermore, Addams viewed this knowledge creation as reciprocal: society benefited from the knowledge that immigrants brought and the immigrants benefited from learning about their new neighbors. Addams was unique in recognizing that immigrants could contribute to American culture.
Addams authored or co-authored a dozen books and over 500 articles after she founded Hull-House. The articles appeared in both scholarly and popular periodicals, establishing Addams as a public philosopher and social leader. Addams was also a much in-demand speaker and she traveled nationally and internationally to make presentations that supported her progressive values. Addams was one of the few women of the era to transgress the private sphere to successfully influence the public sphere. Polls indicate that Addams became one of the most recognized and admired figures in the United States. She was an influential catalyst for change, lending her name and organizing skills to a variety of causes. Addams worked with W.E.B. DuBois in support of a number of African-American endeavors including writing articles for his publication The Crisis and helping to found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People. She helped start the American Civil Liberties Union and organized the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom. Her tireless effort in support of peace led to Addams receiving the 1931 Nobel Peace prize. Addams died of cancer on May 21, 1935. The public memorial at Hull-House filled the streets with mourners and eulogies were published in newspapers nationally and internationally.
There are a number of reasons why Addams was not generally recognized as a philosopher until the late twentieth century which include her gender and her association with social work. Another factor in this lack of recognition is that she was not a systematic philosopher either stylistically or methodologically. Addams’ writing style is not typical of the philosophic tradition in that it lacks a sustained abstract character. For example, in Democracy and Social Ethics, arguably the most philosophical of Addams’ books, the chapters address charity workers, family relationships, domestic workers, industrial working conditions, educational methods and political reforms. To the trained philosopher, these topics appear far removed from more familiar considerations of epistemology, metaphysics and ethics. However, a careful examination of her work reveals that Addams begins with social phenomena and draws theoretical inference from these experiences. In Democracy and Social Ethics, Addams offers intriguing, even radical, insights into the nature of ethics and epistemology. To read Addams as a philosopher requires setting aside assumptions about beginning from abstract theoretical positions. As a pragmatist, Addams is strictly interested in social philosophy. Everything she writes seeks what James would refer to as the “cash value” of an idea for social growth and improvement. Four interrelated cornerstones of her social philosophy are the concepts of sympathetic knowledge, lateral progress, pluralism and fallibilism.
Beginning with her first book, Democracy and Social Ethics and running through all of her works addressing social issues is the notion of sympathetic knowledge. Fundamentally, sympathetic knowledge is the idea that humans can learn about one another in terms that move beyond propositional knowledge, that is rather than merely learning facts, knowledge is gained through openness to disruptive knowledge. Knowledge can be disruptive in the sense that new information can transform one’s perceived experience and understanding. This idea motivated Addams and the residents of Hull-House to undertake the first urban study of racial demographics, which was published as Hull-House Maps and Papers in 1895. Addams integrated epistemological inquiry with ethical analysis such that it was the responsibility of members of a society to know one another better for the purposes of caring and acting on one another’s behalf. Sympathetic knowledge is Addams’ rationale behind social settlements. By providing a physical location where people of different backgrounds could meet, social knowledge is built up reducing the abstraction of distant others transforming them into concrete, known others. Accordingly, Addams suggests that the many social activities sponsored by Hull-House—clubs, dances, performances, athletics—were not frivolous affairs but a means for breaking down barriers between people, thus fostering sympathetic knowledge. In Twenty Years at Hull-House and later in The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams claims that these social activities performed an educative function and that social settlements were in fact thoroughly educative projects. Like Dewey, Addams valued education as the foundation of a healthy democratic society. Like Mead, Addams viewed “play” as an essential aspect of education because of its ability to fire the imagination. Addams takes this notion so far as to argue that play is important for a vibrant democracy because it creates the possibility of empathetic imagination. When one plays, one takes on the roles of others and through fictitious inhabitation of these positions begins to empathize with the plight of others. In this manner, education also contributes to sympathetic knowledge. Similarly, literature and drama can enhance sympathetic knowledge as one empathizes with fictitious characters. Accordingly, Hull-House sponsored community theater as well as the reading of novels.
The basis of sympathetic knowledge is experience that is imaginatively extrapolated. When Addams addresses prostitution in A New Conscience and an Ancient Evil, she employs anecdotes from the Hull-House community to allow her audience to understand the struggles of young women in the big cities. In this manner, she is neither strictly deontological nor teleological in her moral approach. Rather than dealing with principles of sexuality, for example, or the consequences of prostitution on society, although both considerations are important, Addams begins by attempting to increase knowledge of marginalized women. Inherent in this approach to human ontology is a belief in the fundamental goodness and relationality of people. Addams believes that if her audience understands what is going on in the lives of others, even if those others are outcasts, then we may begin to care and possibly take positive action on their behalf. Addams’ method of sympathetic knowledge extends to those with whom she disagreed. For example, in Democracy and Social Ethics, Addams describes her failed political battles with local ward alderman, Johnny Powers (who Addams does not name in print). Hull-House sponsored a number of unsuccessful attempts to unseat Powers. Rather than excoriate Powers for his backroom deals and bribery, Addams set out to understand what made such an alderman popular. Through this method of inquiry, Addams, although not altering her denunciation of Powers’ cronyism, began to understand how the people of the ward appreciated an alderman who was visible and connected to their everyday lives. For Addams, sympathetic knowledge, despite its emotive implications, was a rational attempt to understand others. Accordingly, Addams eschewed antagonism. Ad hominem attacks only foster defensive barriers so Addams employed sympathetic knowledge in what she described as a detached manner. Such an approach might seem counter intuitive, but is understandable for a figure like Addams who bridged the reserved nature of the Victorian era and the moral commitment of the Progressive era.
Given her status as one of the leading figures of the progressive era, it is not surprising that Addams advocated social progress, but she distinguished the particular type of progress she advocated. The industrial revolution had seen many people prosper in the name of economic and technological progress. In addition, Addams had grown up in the post-Civil War era where social progress had been attributed to the newfound rights of African-Americans. Addams, however, viewed such progress to be more abstract than concrete. In the case of economic progress, it was experienced mostly by an elite few with some benefits trickling down to the middle class. From her perspective at Hull-House, she witnessed the inability of immigrants to fully participate in the economy or the political process. Similarly, she saw that although African-Americans ostensibly had legal rights, they often were prevented from actualizing those rights through a combination of laws intended to circumvent equality and racism in social relations. Given these experiences, Addams advocated what she referred to as “lateral progress,” or the idea that for authentic progress to take place, it would have to be experienced in a widespread manner rather than by a privileged few. Furthermore, Addams’ notion of lateral progress was not to be enforced hierarchically from structures of authority. Addams envisioned a progress that was derived from participatory democratic processes.
Addams applied the concept of lateral progress to a number of social issues. When it came to women’s suffrage, for example, Addams did not base her arguments upon principles of equality or fairness. Instead, she argued that such a move represented lateral progress, the inclusion of all—including women—would lead to the betterment of society. Similarly, her support of labor unions was tempered by the notion of lateral progress. Addams did not advocate for collective bargaining merely to benefit those fortunate enough to be in the unions; she viewed labor unions as working toward lateral progress by improving wages, hours and working conditions for all workers.
Addams argued for the inclusion of all members of society in the institution, policies and practices that were to lead to social progress. For example, in a 1930 article, “Widening the Circle of Enlightenment” Addams contends that pluralism has an energizing impact on society and should be embraced rather than feared. In this manner, Addams was an early American theorist who saw the value of diversity. Addams suggested that by bringing their cultural heritage to the United States, immigrants kept America from becoming static. Reciprocally, immigrants benefited from engaging in the cultural heritage found in North America. For Addams, social progress demanded that all voices be heard but she believed in the power of collective intelligence to find common cause from that diversity.
Addams’ valorization of cultural diversity was so thoroughgoing that she integrated it into her pacifist arguments. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams contends that cosmopolitan cities are a model for international peace. While not romanticizing the conflicts between groups that occur in the city, Addams draws on numerous experiences of people from different cultural heritages setting aside their differences to develop working relationships and help one another survive the challenges of urban life. Addams believed that if diverse people under the strain of Chicago’s urban blight could find a way to work together, then countries in the international community could also come to some equilibrium without violence.
Addams applied her pluralistic commitment to intellectual understanding. Hull-House welcomed speakers from a variety of political positions, whether the residents agreed with those positions or not. To foster this openness, Addams eschewed ideological ties for herself and for the Hull-House community. In this manner, although she was sympathetic to many of the arguments of socialists, anarchists, feminists and various Christian leaders, she never entirely accepted any ideological position. Demonstrating her pragmatism, she avoided political labels but variously aligned herself when it meant advancing the cause of social progress. On many occasions, Addams and Hull-House were criticized for not clearly associating themselves with an ideological camp.
Addams maintained a robust definition of democracy that moved far beyond understanding it merely as a political structure. For Addams, democracy represented both a mode of living and a social morality. She viewed democracy as an acknowledgement that the lives of citizens are bound up with one another and this relationship creates a duty to understand the struggles and circumstances of fellow citizens. Reciprocity of social relations is crucial for providing citizens with the empathetic foundation necessary to energize democracy. Social settlements were experiments in the kind of democracy that Addams endeavored to promote: one of active social engagement. Addams’ definition of democracy becomes clearest in Democracy and Social Ethics where she makes two equivalencies clear. One, moral theory in the modern age must emphasize social ethics. Two, for Addams, democracy is social ethics.
Addams metaphorically described democracy as a dynamic organism that must grow with changing times in order to remain vital. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams goes so far as to suggest that it was time that the United States’ political institutions and morality progressed. She argued that America’s founders, whom she admired, developed the Bill of Rights based upon an individual sense of morality appropriate for their era. However, Addams viewed social morality as the appropriate response to the contemporary rise of big cities along with the improvements in technology and transportation that brought so many people together. The time had come to emphasize the social relations necessary for a vibrant democracy under the current historical circumstances. Some commentators describe Addams as advocating a “social democracy,” one that emphasizes a way of being over the political structure. Addams’ valorization of democracy did not entail a static object of affection. She wanted democracy to grow and flourish which required ongoing conversation and change. In this manner, Addams never conflated her love of democracy with unabashed patriotism. Also in Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams develops the notion of “cosmic patriotism,” arguing that one’s commitment to humanity must exceed national borders.
Another aspect of Addams’ work that differentiates it from traditional philosophic literature is its humility. Employing the experimental method of American Pragmatists, Addams described numerous ventures undertaken by the Hull-House community in the name of fostering sympathetic knowledge or lateral progress. However, Addams was not afraid to recount her errors in these efforts. For Addams, mistakes are opportunities for growth and are worth the risk of active engagement. In the process of crossing class and cultural boundaries—moving from the familiar to the unfamiliar—there are bound to be mistakes made, but if they are done in the spirit of care and with humility, then the errors are not insurmountable and have the potential to be great teachers. Time and again, the upper class, college-educated, white women who predominated the Hull-House community demonstrated their lack of cultural sensitivity only to provide Addams with an anecdote for further social analysis and an opportunity to learn from the errors. Mistakes were merely part of the pragmatist cycle of action and reflection.
Twenty Years at Hull-House recounts many of Addams’ mistakes. For example, when Starr and Addams first established the settlement, they furnished Hull-House with the trappings of the high culture with which they were familiar. Addams later regretted this approach and recognized the class alienation that fine furniture, draperies and artwork foster. She later has these items removed for simpler furnishings. In another anecdote from Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams oversees the construction of a coffee house at Hull-House to provide working immigrants with a place to purchase nutritious food without the temptation of alcohol, as was available at local saloons. Despite bringing in modern equipment and using the latest techniques in economical and healthy food production, the coffee house proved unpopular, even with Hull-House residents. Addams came to realize that their paternalism had prevailed, once again alienating their community. Eventually, they made adjustments in the menu to local tastes and the coffee house became another successful part of the Hull-House complex, although more for its contribution to socializing than the cuisine it provided. What is interesting about these anecdotes is that Addams does not attempt to hide or put a positive spin on them. Out of sensitivity for misrepresenting the interests and positions of her neighbors, Addams describes the practice of bringing Hull-House neighbors to her presentations so that she would not be viewed simply as the outside expert attesting to her findings. In this way, mistakes served to improve her practices.
Addams’ pragmatist philosophy integrated experience with theory in an ongoing and dynamic dance that makes it inappropriate to separate her theories from the social issues in which she engaged. This is part of the reason that Addams’ work appears alien to those steeped in the Western tradition of philosophy, which attempts to lay claim to universal truths. Addams makes use of what feminist philosophers have described as “standpoint epistemology,” acknowledging that her philosophy is derived from a particular social, political and historical position. Her theoretical work flowed from working out tangible social issues of her day, and yet many of her themes and conclusions remain relevant for the present.
Perhaps no other issue took more of Addams’ time and attention in the latter part of her public career than did peace. Besides dozens of articles, she authored two books, Newer Ideals of Peace and Peace and Bread in Time of War, she also co-authored Women at The Hague, all books that directly address issues of peace. In addition, many of her other books such as The Long Road of Women’s Memory, The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, and My Friend, Julia Lathrop have at least a chapter dedicated to issues of peace. While Addams avoided ideological positions, she came closest when it came to pacifism. Nevertheless, she never invoked a universal principle such as declaring all war as immoral, however she did contend that violent conflict was regressive, wasteful and provided the possibility of further violence in society.
In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams made it clear that she saw peace as more than the absence of war. For Addams, peace represented an opportunity for social progress because people were capable of working together to achieve social goals. Like many in the late nineteenth century, Addams viewed social evolution as progressing toward greater peaceful relations and social harmony. Collective peace was tied to individual peaceful relations such that communal activism represented peace efforts. For example, helping immigrants thrive in the United States was an act of peace. In this manner, given her commitment to democratic social progress achieved through collective engagement in an effort to foster sympathetic knowledge, Addams extrapolated that war is socially regressive. Armed conflict ends rational and dispassionate conversations impeding the agreement necessary for social growth. War makes opposing human beings into ultimate others—someone so alien that it is possible to kill them—creating the antithesis of sympathetic knowledge.
Addams resisted compartmentalizing her moral philosophy, and she extended this to her ideas about peace. Rather than merely offering a direct normative assessment of militarism, Addams casts a wider net to address variables less causally related to a particular conflict. In “Democracy or Militarism,” written in the context of the Spanish-American War, Addams indicates that society is at a crossroads. According to Addams, to accept militaristic actions as a part of international politics is to normalize brutalization that makes further violence acceptable. To support her claim, she cites instances of increased social violence that can be tied, albeit loosely, to the formal acceptance of war. Furthermore, Addams identifies the gender dimension of increased militarism. In “War Times Changing Women’s Traditions,” Addams resists traditional notions of chivalry and romanticism to claim that the ostensible argument for the violent protection of women can only lead women to a vulnerable position in a society where violence is normalized.
Addams was not merely a social critic. Her social philosophy often included alternative plans of action—not fixed solutions but flexible and revisable outcomes. Addams, like William James, suggests that militarism has been ennobled in cultural traditions and that an ennobling substitute was needed to fire the same kind of dedication. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams offers social activism as the cause that should be rallied around. Addams challenges her readers to imagine heroism in the work of social activists to improve urban life.
Her staunch philosophy of pacifism brought Addams a great amount of personal criticism during her public career. Although many of her contemporaries, like Dewey, would support the United States’ entry into World War I, Addams did not. Her popularity suffered greatly and she faced some of her harshest rebukes as national emotions peaked prior to the onset of war. More significantly, World War I signaled a changing tide for progressivism. Political realism came to the fore, and Addams’ ideals of peace suddenly became culturally archaic. The post World War I period saw the number of social settlements dwindle and American Pragmatism experienced an extended hibernation.
Addams viewed lifelong education as a critical component of an engaged citizenry in a vibrant democracy. To that end, Hull-House sponsored a myriad of educational projects. Addams strived to improve childhood education by working for legislation to reduce child labor, she sponsored a kindergarten at Hull-House and worked with Dewey and education pioneer Ella Flagg Young on pedagogical techniques centered upon making education more relevant for students. Extant descriptions by visitors to Hull-house describe it as permeated by children furiously involved in a myriad of activities.
In the early twentieth century, adolescence was a largely overlooked period of human development and on the occasions when young adulthood was addressed at all, it was usually conceived of as a problem. Addams, who often directed her philosophical analysis to marginalized sectors of society, took a particular interest in adolescence. In what she described as her favorite book, The Spirit of Youth and the City Streets, Addams offers an extended study of the plight of young people and through her Hull-House experiences explains to her readers the needs and challenges of this age. Accordingly, Hull-House sponsored a number of programs for adolescents including social gatherings, athletics and drama. Hull-House engaged in pioneering programs for young women’s sports and physical activity, defying social norms that claimed that exercise was inappropriate for women.
Addams’ commitment to lifelong education resulted in pioneering work in adult education. Hull-House sponsored college extension courses as well as a variety of educational opportunities for adults in the community including lectures and clubs. For example, The Plato Club offered weekly readings and discussions on philosophy, where Dewey sometimes lectured, and The Working People Social Science Club provided an opportunity for discussions of social and political philosophy. Some commentators have claimed that Hull-House was the birthplace of adult education. In The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams describes developing particular pedagogical techniques adapted for adult students including the need for a peer-level social atmosphere and the use of news events as an opportunity for learning.
Addams eschewed ideological labels including that of feminist, nevertheless she was clearly aligned with the feminist movement. She advocated for women’s suffrage and took a leadership role as the Vice-President of the National American Woman Suffrage Association from 1911-1914. Consistent with her notion of lateral progress, Addams’ support for women’s advancement was framed in terms of social progress rather than principles of equality or merely advocating for an oppressed constituency. Addams contended that women brought an alternative perspective to politics and given her commitment to pluralism, alternative perspectives could only strengthen society. For example, in “If Men Were Seeking The Elective Franchise,” Addams parodies the plight of women by commenting on men’s foibles in a manner that mimicked the way men spoke of the reasons women should not be given elective franchise. She accused men of being quarrelsome as well as exhibiting misplaced values in preferring to spend money on armaments than on domestic welfare. Accordingly, Addams is sometimes accused of being a gender essentialist in the language she employed about the nature of men and women.
Addams undertook numerous projects with the empowerment of women as a goal. Hull-House itself was a unique woman-centered project. There were male residents but it was always clear that the leadership and culture of Hull-House were decidedly female. Hull-House supported immigrant mothers in their roles as primary care givers and even took the radical step of disseminating birth control information. One example of Addams’ concern for women can be seen in the creation of the Jane Club, described inTwenty Years at Hull-House. At a time when collective bargaining did not enjoy the legal protections that it does today, Addams observed that women labor union members were particularly vulnerable when it came to periods of unemployment created by strikes or lockouts. When such actions took place, single women could no longer afford rent money. This vulnerability reduced the power of the bargaining unit. Working with women labor leaders such as Mary Kenney, Addams established a workingwoman’s cooperative named the Jane Club. This cooperative ensured that all members’ rent was paid in the event of labor interruptions. Addams eventually secured funding to build housing for the Jane Club but it operated as an independent entity.
Given their commitments to pluralism, classical American philosophers have been generally more sympathetic to the plight of women than many other genres of philosophers, but Addams further sensitized their thought. Contemporary philosopher Charlene Haddock Seigfried coined the term “pragmatist feminism” to describe the fruitful intersection of American philosophy and feminist theory. Seigfried’s quintessential example of a pragmatist feminist was Jane Addams.
Although Addams did not write a book-length work on economics, comment on economic issues permeates her writings. Addams had much in common with socialist analysis, which was particularly popular in this rocky period of American economics. She knew and supported Eugene Debs, and engaged a number of socialist intellectuals in discussions. Given her pursuit of lateral progress, her affinity for socialism is understandable, but Addams’ aversion to antagonism did not allow her to accept the social upheaval espoused in much of the socialist rhetoric. Addams’ support of labor unions exemplified her socialistic leanings. In the formative years of labor organizing, there was a widespread belief that collective bargaining was a mediating step toward a social transformation where eventually greater control of the means of production would be gained by laborers. Addams viewed the amelioration of class differences as representing social progress and therefore supported unionization.
As a result of the Pullman Strike of 1894, Addams became involved in issues of union management relations. Although it was only five years after the opening of Hull-House, Addams had already garnered a public reputation for skilled negotiating and was enlisted to engage in mediation between railroad car workers and George Pullman, the staunch patriarch of the Pullman Palace Car Company and one of the richest men in America. Addams ultimately played a negligible role in the strike because Pullman refused to meet with her. The labor negotiation foundered and the strike ended quickly and painfully for the workers. Addams’ most important contribution was in constructing the legacy of the Pullman strike. Addams penned an eloquent and reflective account of the strike, “A Modern Lear,” in which she compared George Pullman to Shakespeare’s tragic figure, King Lear. It took nearly twenty years for “A Modern Lear” to be printed, as publishers shunned Addams’ critical analysis. Utilizing a process of sympathetic knowledge, Addams does not describe clear-cut heroes and villains in the Pullman strike, but characterizes Pullman as disconnected from his workers, much like King Lear was alienated from his daughter. For Addams, this illustrated the danger of capitalism, that economic barriers isolated people from one another. In a philosophy advocating an engaged society, such barriers retarded progress.
Although Addams has not always been included in the canon of classical American philosophy, her contemporaries, including John Dewey, William James and George Herbert Mead, publicly acknowledged Addams’ influence on their thinking. Therefore, in addition to her own corpus of work, Addams’ intellectual legacy can be found in their philosophy. Nevertheless, for much of the twentieth century, Addams was considered unoriginal and her writing was thought to be derivative of other thinkers. In the 1990’s, a renewed interest in Addams’ theoretical work developed from the feminist practice of revisiting historical boundaries that traditionally limited philosophical qualification. At the turn of the twenty-first century, Addams’ major works have come back in to print and a number of intellectual biographies have reconsidered Addams’ intellectual legacy.
In many ways, Addams took American pragmatism to a logical conclusion: social action. Pragmatists emphasize the dynamic relationship of experience and theory in the service of social advancement. Dewey, James and Mead engaged in social projects from university settings. Addams, who never had an official university appointment, although she did teach occasionally at the University of Chicago, took pragmatist theory out into society and applied it to her projects. However, in the process, she never stopped writing and thematizing her experiences, thus revising and reconsidering her theories. In this manner Addams provides one model of what it is to be a public philosopher.
Lane Community College
U. S. A.
Last updated: October 30, 2006 | Originally published: