Theodor Adorno was one of the foremost continental philosophers of the twentieth century. Although he wrote on a wide range of subjects, his fundamental concern was human suffering—especially modern societies’ effects upon the human condition. He was influenced most notably by Hegel, Marx, and Nietzsche. He was associated with The Institute for Social Research, in the Frankfurt School, which was a social science and cultural intellectual hub for promoting socialism and overthrowing capitalism. It was responsible for the creation of the philosophical form called critical theory, which takes the stand that oppression is created through politics, economics, culture, and materialism, but is maintained most significantly through consciousness. Therefore the focus of action must come from consciousness. The Institute of Social Research deviated from orthodox Marxism in its argument that social and cultural factors played as important a role as economics in oppression.
Adorno made many contributions to critical theory, notably his view that reason had become entangled with domination and suffering. Adorno coined the tern ‘identity thinking’ to describe the process of categorical thought in modern society, by which everything becomes an example of an abstract, and thus nothing individual in its actual specific uniqueness is allowed to exist. He lamented that the human race had gone from understanding the world through myth to understanding it through scientific reasoning, but that this latter ‘enlightenment’ was the same as understanding the world through myth. Both modes create a viewpoint that the subjective must conform to an outside world to which it has no control. Within this argument, Adorno saw morality as being stuck within this powerless subjective: in a world that values only recognizable facts, morality becomes nihilistic, a mere prejudice of individual subjectivity. Adorno is also known for his critique of the ‘the culture industry.’ He felt that the entertainment industry of modern society is just as mechanical, formulaic, and dominating as the workplace. He argued that humans in modern society are programmed at work and in their leisure, and though they seek to escape the monotony of their workplace, they are merely changing to another piece of the machine – from producer to consumer. There is no chance of becoming free individuals who can take part in the creation of society, whether at work or play.
Theodor Wiesengrund Adorno was born in 1903 to relatively affluent parents in central Germany. His mother was a gifted singer, of Italian descent, and his father was a Jewish wine merchant. Adorno’s partial Jewish status was to have an immeasurable effect upon his life and philosophical works. He was an academically and musically gifted child. Initially, it appeared that Adorno was destined for a musical career. During the early to mid 1920s Adorno studied music composition under Alban Berg in Vienna and his talent was recognized by the likes of Berg and Schoenberg. However, in the late 1920s, Adorno joined the faculty of the University of Frankfurt and devoted the greatest part of his considerable talent and energy to the study and teaching of philosophy. Adorno’s Jewish heritage forced him to eventually seek exile from Nazi Germany, initially registering as a doctoral student at Merton College, Oxford and then, as a member of the University of Frankfurt’s Institute for Social Research, in New York concluding his exile in Southern California. Adorno did not complete his Oxford doctorate and appeared to be persistently unhappy in his exilic condition. Along with other members of the Institute for Social Research, Adorno returned to the University of Frankfurt immediately after the completion of the war, taking up a professorial chair in philosophy and sociology. Adorno remained a professor at the University of Frankfurt until his death in 1969. He was married to Gretel and they had no children.
Adorno is generally recognized within the Continental tradition of philosophy as being one of the foremost philosophers of the 20th Century. His collected works comprise some twenty-three volumes. He wrote on subjects ranging from musicology to metaphysics and his writings span to include such things as philosophical analyses of Hegelian metaphysics, a critical study of the astrology column of the Los Angeles Times, and jazz. In terms of both style and content, Adorno’s writings defy convention. In seeking to attain a clear understanding of the works of any philosopher, one should begin by asking oneself what motivated his or her philosophical labors. What was Adorno attempting to achieve through his philosophical writings? Adorno’s philosophy is fundamentally concerned with human suffering. It is founded upon a central moral conviction: that the development of human civilization has been achieved through the systematic repression of nature and the consolidation of insidiously oppressive social and political systems, to which we are all exposed. The shadow of human suffering falls across practically all of Adorno’s writings. Adorno considered his principal task to be that of testifying to the persistence of such conditions and thereby, at best, retaining the possibility that such conditions might be changed for the better. The central tension in Adorno’s diagnosis of what he termed ‘damaged life’ consists in the unrelentingly critical character of his evaluation of the effects of modern societies upon their inhabitants, coupled with a tentative, but absolutely essential, commitment to a belief in the possibility of the elimination of unnecessary suffering. As in the work of all genuine forms of critical philosophy, Adorno’s otherwise very bleak diagnosis of modernity is necessarily grounded within a tentative hope for a better world.
Adorno’s philosophy is typically considered to have been most influenced by the works of three previous German philosophers: Hegel, Marx, and Nietzsche. In addition, his association with the Institute of Social Research profoundly affected the development of Adorno’s thought. I shall begin by discussing this last, before briefly summarizing the influence of the first three.
The Institute for Social Research was established at the University of Frankfurt in 1923. The Institute, or the ‘Frankfurt School’, as it was later to become known, was an inter-disciplinary body comprising specialists in such fields as philosophy, economics, political science, legal theory, psychoanalysis, and the study of cultural phenomena such as music, film, and mass entertainment. The establishment of The Frankfurt School was financed by the son of a wealthy grain merchant who wished to create a western European equivalent to the Marx-Engels Institute in Moscow. The Intellectual labor of the Institute in Frankfurt thus explicitly aimed at contributing to the overthrow of capitalism and the establishment of socialism.
However, from 1930 onwards, under the Directorship of Max Horkheimer, the work of the Frankfurt School began to show subtle but highly significant deviations from orthodox Marxism. Principally, the School began to question, and ultimately reject, the strict economic determinism to which orthodox Marxism was enthralled at the time. This coincided with a firm belief amongst the members of the School that social phenomena, such as culture, mass entertainment, education, and the family played a direct role in maintaining oppression. Marxists had typically dismissed the importance of such phenomena on the grounds that they were mere reflections of the underlying economic basis of the capitalist mode of production. An undue concern for such phenomena was thus generally thought of as, at best, a distraction from the real task of overthrowing capitalism, at worst a veritable hindrance. In contrast, the Frankfurt School argued that such phenomena were fundamentally important, in their own right. The Frankfurt School thus challenged the economically-centric character of Marxism. The Frankfurt School’s rejection of economic determinism and interest in the social and cultural planes of human oppression culminated in a far more circumspect appraisal of the likelihood of capitalism’s demise. The Frankfurt School rejected the Marx’s belief in the economic inevitability of capitalism experiencing cataclysmic economic crises. The Frankfurt School continued to argue that capitalism remained an oppressive system, but increasingly viewed the system as far more adaptable and robust than Marxists had given it credit for. The Frankfurt School came to portray capitalism as potentially capable of averting its own demise indefinitely. The final break with orthodox Marxism occurred with the Frankfurt School’s coming to condemn the Soviet Union as a politically oppressive system. Politically the Frankfurt School sought to position itself equidistant from both Soviet socialism and liberal capitalism. The greater cause of human emancipation appeared to call for the relentless criticism of both systems.
The Frankfurt School’s contribution to the cause of human emancipation consisted in the production of primarily theoretical studies of social and cultural phenomena. This brand of theoretical study is generally referred to as ‘critical theory’. Although originating with the Frankfurt School, critical theory has now achieved the status of a distinct and separate form of philosophical study, taught and practiced in university departments throughout the world. What, then, are the central philosophical characteristics of critical theory and to what extent does Adorno’s philosophy share these characteristics? Critical theory is founded upon an unequivocal normative basis. Taking a cold, hard look at the sheer scale of human misery and suffering experienced during the 20th century in particular, critical theory aims to testify to the extent and ultimate causes of the calamitous state of human affairs. The ultimate causes of such suffering are, of course, to be located in the material, political, economic, and social conditions which human beings simultaneously both produce and are exposed to. However, critical theory refrains from engaging in any direct, political action. Rather, critical theorists argue that suffering and domination are maintained, to a significant degree, at the level of consciousness and the various cultural institutions and phenomena that sustain that consciousness. Critical theory restricts itself to engaging with such phenomena and aims to show the extent to which ‘uncritical theory’ contributes to the perpetuation of human suffering. Critical theory has thus been defined as ‘a tradition of social thought that, in part at least, takes its cue from its opposition to the wrongs and ills of modern societies on the one hand, and the forms of theorizing that simply go along with or seek to legitimate those societies on the other hand.’ (J.M.Bernstein, 1995:11)
Max Horkheimer, the Director of the Frankfurt School, contrasted critical theory with what he referred to as ‘traditional theory’. For Horkheimer the paradigm of traditional theory consisted in those forms of social science that modeled themselves upon the methodologies of natural science. Such ‘positivistic’ forms of social science attempted to address and account for human and social phenomena in terms analogous to the natural scientist’s study of material nature. Thus, legitimate knowledge of social reality was considered to be attainable through the application of objective forms of data gathering, yielding, ultimately, quantifiable data. A strict adherence to such a positivist methodology entailed the exclusion or rejection of any phenomena not amenable to such procedures. Ironically, a strict concern for acquiring purely objective knowledge of human social action ran the very real risk of excluding from view certain aspects or features of the object under study. Horkheimer criticized positivism on two grounds. First, that it falsely represented human social action. Second, that the representation of social reality produced by positivism was politically conservative, helping to support the status quo, rather than challenging it. The first criticism consisted of the argument that positivism systematically failed to appreciate the extent to which the so-called social facts it yielded did not exist ‘out there’, so to speak, but were themselves mediated by socially and historically mediated human consciousness. Positivism ignored the role of the ‘observer’ in the constitution of social reality and thereby failed to consider the historical and social conditions affecting the representation of social facts. Positivism falsely represented the object of study by reifying social reality as existing objectively and independently of those whose action and labor actually produced those conditions. Horkheimer argued, in contrast, that critical theory possessed a reflexive element lacking in the positivistic traditional theory. Critical theory attempted to penetrate the veil of reification so as to accurately determine the extent to which the social reality represented by traditional theory was partial and, in important respects, false. False precisely because of traditional theory’s failure to discern the inherently social and historical character of social reality. Horkheimer expressed this point thus: “the facts which our senses present to us are socially preformed in two ways: through the historical character of the object perceived and through the historical character of the perceiving organ. Both are not simply natural; they are shaped by human activity, and yet the individual perceives himself as receptive and passive in the act of perception.” Horkheimer’s emphasis upon the detrimental consequences of the representational fallacies of positivism for the individual is at the heart of his second fundamental criticism of traditional theory. Horkheimer argues that traditional theory is politically conservative in two respects. First, traditional theory falsely ‘naturalizes’ contingent social reality, thereby obscuring the extent to which social reality emanates not from nature, but from the relationship between human action and nature. This has the effect of circumscribing a general awareness of the possibility of change. Individuals come to see themselves as generally confronted by an immutable and intransigent social world, to which they must adapt and conform if they wish to survive. Second, and following on from this, conceiving of reality in these terms serves to unduly pacify individuals. Individuals come to conceive of themselves as relatively passive recipients of the social reality, falsely imbued with naturalistic characteristics, that confronts them. We come to conceive of the potential exercise of our individual and collective will as decisively limited by existing conditions, as we find them, so to speak. The status quo is falsely perceived as a reflection of some natural, inevitable order.
Adorno was a leading member of the Frankfurt School. His writings are widely considered as having made a highly significant contribution to the development of critical theory. Adorno unequivocally shared the moral commitment of critical theory. He also remained deeply suspicious of positivistic social science and directed a large part of his intellectual interests to a critical analysis of the philosophical basis of this approach. He shared the Frankfurt School’s general stance in respect of orthodox Marxism and economic determinism, in particular. Adorno persistently criticized any and all philosophical perspectives which posited the existence of some ahistorical and immutable basis to social reality. He thus shared Horkheimer’s criticisms of any and all attempts at ‘naturalizing’ social reality. However, Adorno ultimately proceeded to explicate an account of the entwinement of reason and domination that was to have a profound effect upon the future development of critical theory. In stark contrast to the philosophical convention which counter-posed reason and domination, whereby the latter is to be confronted with and dissolved by the application of reason so as to achieve enlightenment, Adorno was to argue that reason itself had become entangled with domination. Reason had become a tool and device for domination and suffering. This led Adorno to reassess the prospects for overcoming domination and suffering. Put simply, Adorno was far more sanguine in respect of the prospects for realizing critical theory’s aims than other members of the Frankfurt School. Adorno was perhaps the most despairing of the Frankfurt School intellectuals.
The Frankfurt School provided Adorno with an intellectual ‘home’ in which to work. The development of Adorno’s thought was to have a profound effect upon the future development of critical theory. Adorno’s philosophy itself owed much to the works of Hegel, Marx, and Nietzsche. The greater part of Adorno’s thought, his account of reason, his understanding of the role of consciousness in the constitution of reality, and his vision of domination and human suffering are all imbued with the thought of these earlier philosophers. Adorno’s philosophy consists, in large part, of a dialogue with these philosophers and their particular, and very different, visions of the formation and deformation of social reality. I shall briefly consider each in turn.
Hegel’s philosophy is notoriously abstruse and difficult to fully understand. There are aspects of Hegel’s thought which Adorno consistently criticized and rejected. However, what Adorno did take from Hegel, amongst other things, was a recognition that philosophy was located within particular socio-historical conditions. The objects of philosophical study and, indeed, the very exercise of philosophy itself, were social and historical phenomena. The object of philosophy was not the discovery of timeless, immutable truths, but rather to provide interpretations of a socially constituted reality. Hegel was also to insist that understanding human behavior was only possible through engaging with the distinct socio-historical conditions, of which human beings were themselves a part. In stark contrast to Immanuel Kant’s conception of the self-constituting character of human consciousness, Hegel argued that human consciousness was mediated by the socio-historical conditions of specific individuals. Further, Hegel argued that the development of each individual’s self-consciousness could only proceed through relations with other individuals: attaining a consciousness of oneself entailed the existence of others. No one single human being was capable of achieving self-consciousness and exercising reason by herself. Finally, Hegel also argued that the constitution of social reality proceeded through subjects’ relationship with the ‘objective’, material realm. In stark contrast to positivism, an Hegelian inspired understanding of social reality accorded a necessary and thoroughly active role to the subject. Hegel draws our attention to our own role in producing the objective reality with which positivists confront us. Adorno was in basic agreement with all of the above aspects of Hegel’s philosophy. A recognition of philosophy as a socio-historical phenomenon and an acceptance of the socio-historical conditions of human consciousness remained central to Adorno’s thought.
However, Adorno differed from Hegel most unequivocally on one particularly fundamental point. Hegel notoriously posited the existence of some ultimately constitutive ground of human reality, in the metaphysical form ‘Geist’, or ‘Spirit’. Hegel ultimately viewed reality as a manifestation of some a priori form of consciousness, analogous to a god. In conceiving of material reality as emanating from consciousness, Hegel was expounding a form of philosophical Idealism. Adorno would never accept this aspect of Hegel’s thought. Adorno consistently argued that any such recourse to some a priori, ultimately ahistorical basis to reality was itself best seen as conditioned by material forces and conditions. For Adorno, the abstractness of such philosophical arguments actually revealed the unduly abstract character of specific social conditions. Adorno could thereby criticize Hegel for not according enough importance to the constitutive character of distinct social and historical conditions.
Such criticisms reveal the influence of Karl Marx’s thought upon the development of Adorno’s thought. Marx has famously been described as standing Hegel on his head. Where Hegel ultimately viewed consciousness as determining the form and content of material conditions, Marx argued that material conditions ultimately determined, or fundamentally conditioned, human consciousness. For Marx, the ultimate grounds of social reality and the forms of human consciousness required for the maintenance of this reality were economic conditions. Marx argued that, within capitalist societies, human suffering and domination originated in the economic relations characteristic of capitalism. Put simply, Marx argued that those who produced economic wealth, the proletariat, were alienated from the fruits of their labor as a result of having to sell their labor to those who controlled the forces of production: those who owned the factories and the like, the bourgeoisie. The disproportionate wealth and power of the bourgeoisie resulted from the extraction of an economic surplus from the product of the proletariat’s labor, in the form of profit. Those who owned the most, thus did the least to attain that wealth, whereas those who had the least, did the most. Capitalism was thus considered to be fundamentally based upon structural inequality and entailed one class of people treating another class as mere instruments of their own will. Under capitalism, Marx argued, human beings could never achieve their full, creative potential as a result of being bound to fundamentally alienating, dehumanizing forms of economic production. Capitalism ultimately reduces everyone, bourgeoisie and proletariat alike, to mere appendages of the machine.
Adorno shared Marx’s view of capitalism as a fundamentally dehumanizing system. Adorno’s commitment to Marxism caused him, for example, to retain a lifelong suspicion of those accounts of liberalism founded upon abstract notions of formal equality and the prioritization of economic and property rights. Adorno’s account of domination was thus deeply indebted to Marx’s account of domination. In addition, in numerous articles and larger works, Adorno was to lay great stress on Marx’s specific understanding of capitalism and the predominance of exchange value as the key determinant of worth in capitalist societies. As will be shown later, the concept of exchange value was central to Adorno’s analysis of culture and entertainment in capitalist societies. Marx’s account of capitalism enabled critical theory and Adorno to go beyond a mere assertion of the social grounds of reality and the constitutive role of the subject in the production of that reality. Adorno was not simply arguing that all human phenomena were socially determined. Rather, he was arguing that an awareness of the extent of domination required both an appreciation of the social basis of human life coupled with the ability to qualitatively distinguish between various social formations in respect of the degree of human suffering prerequisite for their maintenance. To a significant degree, Marx’s account of capitalism provided Adorno with the means for achieving this. However, as I argued above, Adorno shared the Frankfurt School’s suspicions of the more economically determinist aspects of Marx’s thought. Beyond even this, Adorno’s account of reason and domination ultimately drew upon philosophical sources that were distinctly non-Marxian in character.
Foremost amongst these were the writings of Friedrich Nietzsche. Of all the critical theorists, the writings of Nietzsche have exerted the most influence upon Adorno in two principal respects. First, Adorno basically shared the importance which Nietzsche attributed to the autonomous individual. However, Nietzsche’s account of the autonomous individual differs in several highly important respects from that typically associated with the rationalist tradition, within which the concept of the autonomous individual occupied a central place. In contrast to those philosophers, such as Kant, who tended to characterize autonomy in terms of the individual gaining a systematic control over her desires and acting in accordance with formal, potentially universalizable rules and procedures, Nietzsche placed far greater importance upon spontaneous, creative human action as constituting the pinnacle of human possibility. Nietzsche considered the ‘rule-bound’ account of autonomy to be little more than a form of self-imposed heteronomy. For Nietzsche, reason exercised in this fashion amounted to a form of self-domination. One might say that Nietzsche espoused an account of individual autonomy as aesthetic self-creation. Being autonomous entailed treating one’s life as a potential work of art. This account of autonomy exercised an important and consistent influence upon Adorno’s own understanding of autonomy. Furthermore, Adorno’s concern for the autonomous individual was absolutely central to his moral and political philosophy.
Adorno argued that a large part of what was so morally wrong with complex, capitalist societies consisted in the extent to which, despite their professed individualist ideology, these societies actually frustrated and thwarted individuals’ exercise of autonomy. Adorno argued, along with other intellectuals of that period, that capitalist society was a mass, consumer society, within which individuals were categorized, subsumed, and governed by highly restrictive social, economic and, political structures that had little interest in specific individuals. For Adorno, the majority of peoples’ lives were lead within mass, collective entities and structures, from school to the workplace and beyond. Being a true individual, in the broadly Nietzschean sense of that term, was considered to be nigh on impossible under these conditions.
In addition to this aspect of Nietzsche’s influence upon Adorno, the specific understanding which Adorno developed in respect of the relationship between reason and domination owed much to Nietzsche. Nietzsche refused to endorse any account of reason as a thoroughly benign, or even disinterested force. Nietzsche argued that the development and deployment of reason was driven by power. Above all else, Nietzsche conceived of reason as a principal means of domination; a tool for dominating nature and others. Nietzsche vehemently criticized any and all non-adversarial accounts of reason. On this reading, reason is a symptom of, and tool for, domination and hence not a means for overcoming or remedying domination. Adorno came to share some essential features of this basically instrumentalist account of reason. The book he wrote with Max Horkheimer, Dialectic of Enlightenment, which is a foremost text of critical theory, grapples with precisely this account of reason. However, Adorno refrained from simply taking over Nietzsche’s account in its entirety. Most importantly, Adorno basically shared Nietzsche’s account of the instrumentalization of reason. However Adorno insisted against Nietzsche that the transformation of reason was less an expression of human nature and more a consequence of contingent social conditions which might, conceivably, be changed. Where Nietzsche saw domination as an essential feature of human society, Adorno argued that domination was contingent and potentially capable of being overcome. Obviously, letting go of this particular aspiration would be intellectually cataclysmic to the emancipatory aims of critical theory. Adorno uses Nietzsche in an attempt to bolster, not undermine, critical theory.
Adorno considered philosophy to be a social and historical exercise, bound by both the past and existing traditions and conditions. Hence, it would be fair to say that many philosophical streams run into the river of Adorno’s own writings. However, the works of Hegel, Marx, and Nietzsche exercised a profound and lasting influence upon the form and content of Adorno’s work. It is now time to move on and engage with certain key aspects of Adorno’s philosophical writings. I shall focus upon three aspects of Adorno’s writings so as to provide a clear summary of the scope and substance of Adorno’s philosophy: his understanding of reason and what he termed ‘identity thinking’; his moral philosophy and discussion of nihilism; and finally, his analysis of culture and its effects upon capitalist societies.
Adorno unequivocally rejected the view that philosophy and the exercise of reason afforded access to a realm of pristine thoughts and reality. In stark contrast to those rationalists such as Plato, who posited the existence of an ultimate realm of reality and truth underlying the manifest world, Adorno argued that philosophical concepts actually expressed the social structures within which they were found. Adorno consistently argued that there is no such thing as pure thought: thinking is a socio-historical form of activity. Hence, Adorno argued that there did not exist a single standpoint from which ‘truth’ could be universally discerned. To many this may sound like mere philosophical relativism: the doctrine which claims that all criteria of truth are socially and historically relative and contingent. However, the charge of relativism has rarely been leveled at Adorno’s work. Relativists are typically accused of espousing a largely uncritical form of theorizing. A belief in the social contingency of truth criteria appears to exclude the possibility of criticizing social practices and beliefs by recourse to practices and beliefs alien to that society. Further, their commitment to the notion of contingency has frequently resulted in philosophical relativists being accused of unduly affirming the legitimacy claims of any given social practice or belief without subjecting them to a sufficiently critical scrutiny. No such criticisms have been made of Adorno’s work. Adorno’s analysis of philosophical concepts aims to uncover the extent to which such concepts are predicated upon, and manifestations of, relations of power and domination.
Adorno coined the term ‘identity thinking’ to refer to that form of thinking which is the most expressive philosophical manifestation of power and domination. Drawing a contrast between his own form of dialectical thinking and identity thinking, Adorno wrote that “dialectics seek to say what something is, while ‘identarian’ thinking says what something comes under, what it exemplifies or represents, and what, accordingly, it is not itself.” (1990:149). A perfect example of identity thinking would be those forms of reasoning found within bureaucracies where individual human beings are assembled within different classes or categories. The bureaucracy can thus only be said to ‘know’ any specific individual as an exemplar of the wider category to which that individual has been assigned. The sheer, unique specificity of the individual in question is thereby lost to view. One is liable to being treated as a number, and not as a unique person. Thus, Adorno condemns identity thinking as systematically and necessarily misrepresenting reality by means of the subsumption of specific phenomena under general, more abstract classificatory headings within which the phenomenal world is cognitively assembled. While this mode of representing reality may have the advantage of facilitating the manipulation of the material environment, it does so at the cost of failing to attend to the specificity of any given phenomenal entity; everything becomes a mere exemplar. One consequence of apprehending reality in this way is the elimination of qualities or properties that may inhere within any given object but which are conceptually excluded from view, so to speak, as a result of the imposition of a classificatory framework. In this way, identity thinking misrepresents its object. Adorno’s understanding and use of the concept of identity thinking provides a veritable foundation for his philosophy and ultimately underlies much of his writing. One of the principal examples of Adorno’s analysis of identity thinking is to be found in his and Horkheimer’s critical study of enlightenment, presented within their Dialectic of Enlightenment.
The centerpiece of Adorno and Horkheimer’s highly unusual text is an essay on the concept of enlightenment. The essay presents both a critical analysis of enlightenment and an account of the instrumentalization of reason. The Enlightenment is characteristically thought of as an historical period, spanning the 17th and 18th Centuries, embodying the emancipatory ideals of modernity. Enlightenment intellectuals were united by a common vision in which a genuinely human social and political order was to be achieved through the dissolution of previously oppressive, unenlightened, institutions. The establishment of enlightenment ideals was to be achieved by creating the conditions in which individuals could be free to exercise their own reason, free from the dictates of rationally indefensible doctrine and dogma. The means for establishing this new order was the exercise of reason. Freeing reason from the societal bonds which had constrained it was identified as the means for achieving human sovereignty over a world which was typically conceived of as the manifestation of some higher, divine authority. Enlightenment embodies the promise of human beings finally taking individual and collective control over the destiny of the species. Adorno and Horkheimer refused to endorse such a wholly optimistic reading of the effects of the rationalization of society. They stated, “in the most general sense of progressive thought, the Enlightenment has always aimed at liberating men from fear and establishing their sovereignty. Yet the fully enlightened earth radiates disaster triumphant.” (1979:3)
How do Adorno and Horkheimer conceive of the ‘fully enlightened earth’ and what is the nature of the ‘disaster’ that ensues from this? Adorno and Horkheimer’s understanding of enlightenment differs in several highly significant respects from the conventional understanding of the concept. They do not conceive of enlightenment as confined to a distinct historical period. As a recent commentator on Adorno has written, “Adorno and Horkheimer do not use the term ‘enlightenment’ primarily to designate a historical period ranging from Descartes to Kant. Instead they use it to refer to a series of related intellectual and practical operations which are presented as demythologizing, secularizing or disenchanting some mythical, religious or magical representation of the world.” (Jarvis, 1998:24). Adorno and Horkheimer extend their understanding of enlightenment to refer to a mode of apprehending reality found in the writings of classical Greek philosophers, such as Parmenides, to 20th century positivists such as Bertrand Russell. At the core of Adorno and Horkheimer’s understanding of enlightenment are two related theses: “myth is already enlightenment, and enlightenment reverts to mythology.” (1979: xvi). An analysis of the second of these two theses will suffice to explicate the concept of enlightenment Adorno and Horkheimer present. Adorno and Horkheimer’s understanding of enlightenment differs fundamentally from those accounts of the development of human thought and civilization that posit a developmental schema according to which human history is considered as progressively proceeding through separate stages of cognitively classifying and apprehending reality. These accounts typically describe the cognitive ascent of humanity as originating in myth, proceeding to religion, and culminating in secular, scientific reasoning. On this view, the scientific worldview ushered in by the enlightenment is seen as effecting a radical intellectual break and transition from that which went before.
Adorno and Horkheimer fundamentally challenge this assumption. Their thesis that ‘myth is already enlightenment’ is based on the claim that the development of human thought possesses a basic continuity. Both myth and enlightenment are modes of representing reality, both attempt to explain and account for reality. Adorno and Horkheimer’s second thesis, that enlightenment reverts to mythology requires a far more detailed explanation since it entails engaging with their entire understanding of reason and its relationship with heteronomy. They aim to demonstrate that and how enlightenment’s rationalization of society comes to revert to the character of a mythical order. Adorno and Horkheimer argue that enlightenment’s reversion to mythology amounts to the betrayal of the emancipatory ideals of enlightenment. However, they view the betrayal of enlightenment as being inherently entwined with enlightenment itself. For them, the reversion to mythology primarily means reverting to an unreflexive, uncritical mode of configuring and understanding reality. Reverting to mythology means the institution of social conditions, over which individuals come to have little perceived control. Reverting to mythology means a reversion to a heteronomous condition.
Adorno and Horkheimer conceive of enlightenment as principally a demythologizing mode of apprehending reality. For them, the fundamental aim of enlightenment is the establishment of human sovereignty over material reality, over nature: enlightenment is founded upon the drive to master and control nature. The realization of this aim requires the ability to cognitively and practically manipulate the material environment in accordance with our will. In order to be said to dominate nature, nature must become an object of our will. Within highly technologically developed societies, the constraints upon our ability to manipulate nature are typically thought of in terms of the development of technological, scientific knowledge: the limits of possibility are determined not by a mythical belief in god, say, but in the development of the technological forces available to us. This way of conceiving of the tangible limits to human action and cognition had first to overcome a belief that the natural order contained, and was the product of, mythical beings and entities whose presumed existence constituted the ultimate form of authority for those societies enthralled by them. The realization of human sovereignty required the dissolution of such beliefs and the disenchantment of nature. Adorno and Horkheimer write, “the program of the Enlightenment was the disenchantment of the world; the dissolution of myths and the substitution of knowledge for fancy. From now on, matter would at last be mastered without any illusion of ruling or inherent powers, of hidden qualities.” (1979:3-6) Overcoming myth was effected by conceiving of myth as a form of anthropomorphism, as already a manifestation of human cognition so that a realm which had served to constrain the development of technological forces was itself a creation of mankind, falsely projected onto the material realm. On this reading, enlightenment is conceived of as superseding and replacing mythical and religious belief systems, the falsity of which consist, in large part, of their inability to discern the subjective character and origins of these beliefs.
Few would dispute a view of enlightenment as antithetical to myth. However, Adorno and Horkheimer’s claim that enlightenment reverts to mythology is considerably more contentious. While many anthropologists and social theorists, for example have come to accept Adorno and Horkheimer’s claim that myth and enlightenment have the same functional purpose of representing and understanding reality, most political theorists would take great issue with the claim that enlightenment has regressed, or relapsed into some mythical state since this latter claim clearly implies that the general state of social and political freedom assumed to exist in ‘enlightened’ societies is largely bogus. This is, however, precisely what Adorno and Horkheimer argue. They argue that human beings’ attempt to gain sovereignty over nature has been pursued through, in large part, the accumulation of objective, verifiable knowledge of the material realm and its constitutive processes: we take control over nature by understanding how it can be made to work for us. Viewed in this way, the value of nature is necessarily conceived of in primarily instrumental terms: nature is thought of as an object for, and instrument of, human will. This conception of nature necessitates drawing a distinction between this realm and those beings for whom it is an object. Thus, the instrumentalist conception of nature entails a conception of human beings as categorically distinct entities, capable of becoming subjects through the exercise of reason upon nature. The very category of subject thus has inscribed within it a particular conception of nature as that which is to be subordinated to one’s will: subject and object are hierarchically juxtaposed, just as they are in the works of, for example, Descartes and Kant. For nature to be considered amenable to such subordination requires that it be conceived of as synonymous with the objectified models through which human subjects represent nature to themselves. To be wholly conceivable in these terms requires the exclusion of any properties that cannot be subsumed within this representational understanding of nature, this particular form of identity thinking. Adorno and Horkheimer state, “the concordance between the mind of man and the nature of things that he had in mind is patriarchal: the human mind, which overcomes superstition, is to hold sway over a disenchanted nature.” (1979:4) Nature is thereby configured as the object of human will and representation. In this way, our criteria governing the identification and pursuit of valid knowledge are grounded within a hierarchical relationship between human beings and nature: reason is instrumentalized. For Adorno and Horkheimer then, “myth turns into enlightenment, and nature into mere objectivity. Men pay for the increase of their power with alienation from that over which they exercise their power. Enlightenment behaves towards things as a dictator toward men. He knows them in so far as he can manipulate them. The man of science knows things in so far as he can make them. In this way, their potentiality is turned to his own ends.” (1979:9) Adorno and Horkheimer insist that this process results in the establishment of a generally heteronomous social order; a condition over which human beings have little control. Ultimately, the drive to dominate nature results in the establishment of a form of reasoning and a general world-view which appears to exist independently of human beings and, more to the point, is principally characterized by a systematic indifference to human beings and their sufferings: we ultimately become mere objects of the form of reason that we have created. Adorno and Horkheimer insist that individual self-preservation in ‘enlightened’ societies requires that each of us conform to the dictates of instrumental reason.
How do Adorno and Horkheimer attempt to defend such a fundamentally controversial claim? Throughout his philosophical lifetime Adorno argued that authoritative forms of knowledge have become largely conceived of as synonymous with instrumental reasoning; that the world has come to be conceived of as identical with its representation within instrumental reasoning. Reality is thus deemed discernible only in the form of objectively verifiable facts and alternative modes of representing reality are thereby fundamentally undermined. A successful appeal to the ‘facts’ of a cause has become the principal means for resolving disputes and settling disputes in societies such as ours. However, Adorno argued that human beings are increasingly incapable of legitimately excluding themselves from those determinative processes thought to prevail within the disenchanted material realm: human beings become objects of the form of reasoning through which their status as subjects is first formulated. Thus, Adorno discerns a particular irony in the totalizing representation of reality which enlightenment prioritizes. Human sovereignty over nature is pursued by the accumulation of hard, objective data which purport to accurately describe and catalogue this reality. The designation of ‘legitimate knowledge’ is thereby restricted to that thought of as ‘factual’: legitimate knowledge of the world is that which purports to accurately reflect how the world is. As it stands, of course, the mere act of describing any particular aspect of the material realm does not, by itself, promote the cause of human freedom. It may directly facilitate the exercise of freedom by providing sufficient knowledge upon which an agent may exercise discretionary judgment concerning, say, the viability of any particular desire, but, by itself, accurate descriptions of the world are not a sufficient condition for freedom. Adorno, however, argues that the very constituents of this way of thinking are inextricably entwined with heteronomy. In commenting upon Adorno and Horkheimer’s claim that enlightenment restricts legitimate knowledge to the category of objectively verifiable facts, Simon Jarvis writes: “thought is to confine itself to the facts, which are thus the point at which thought comes to a halt. The question as to whether these facts might change is ruled out by enlightened thought as a pseudo-problem. Everything which is, is thus represented as a kind of fate, no less unalterable and uninterogable than mythical fate itself.” (1998:24). Conceived of in this way, material reality appears as an immutable and fixed order of things which necessarily pre-structures and pre-determines our consciousness of it. As Adorno and Horkheimer themselves state, “factuality wins the day; cognition is restricted to its repetition; and thought becomes mere tautology. The more the machinery of thought subjects existence to itself, the more blind its resignation in reproducing existence. Hence enlightenment reverts to mythology, which it never really knew how to elude. For in its figures mythology had the essence of the status quo: cycle, fate, and domination of the world reflected as the truth and deprived of hope.” (1979:27) Facts have come to take on the same functional properties of a belief in the existence of some mythical forces or beings: representing an external order to which we must conform. The ostensible difference between them is that the realm of facts appears to be utterly objective and devoid of any subjective, or anthropomorphic forces. Indeed, the identification of a truly objective order was explicitly pursued through the exclusion of any such subjective prejudices and fallacies. Subjective reasoning is fallacious reasoning, on this view.
Adorno’s attempt to account for this objective order as constituted through identity thinking poses a fundamental challenge to the epistemological conceit of such views. Adorno and Horkheimer argued that the instrumentalization of reason and the epistemological supremacy of ‘facts’ served to establish a single order, a single mode of representing and relating to reality. For them, “enlightenment is totalitarian” (1979:24). The pursuit of human sovereignty over nature is predicated upon a mode of reasoning whose functioning necessitates subsuming all of nature within a single, representational framework. We possess knowledge of the world as a result of the accumulation of facts, ‘facts’ that are themselves necessarily abstractions from that to which they refer. Assembled within a classificatory scheme these facts are not, cannot ever be, a direct expression of that to which they refer; no aspect of its thought, by its very nature, can ever legitimately be said to possess that quality. However, while facts constitute the principal constituents of this classificatory scheme, the scheme itself, this mode of configuring reality, is founded upon a common, single cognitive currency, which necessarily holds that the essence of all that can be known is reducible to a single, inherently quantifiable property: matter. They insist that this mode of configuring reality originates within a desire to dominate nature and that this domination is effected by reducing the manifold diversity of nature to, ultimately, a single, manipulable form. For them the realization of the single totality that proceeds from the domination of nature necessitates that reason itself be shorn of any ostensibly partial or particularistic elements. They conceive of enlightenment as aspiring towards the institution of a form of reasoning which is fundamentally universal and abstract in character: a form of reasoning which posits the existence of a unified order, a priori. They argue, “in advance, the Enlightenment recognizes as being and occurrence only what can be apprehended in unity: its ideal is the system from which all and everything follows. Its rationalist and empiricist versions do not part company on this point.” (1979:7) Thus, the identarian character of enlightenment, on this reading, consists of the representation of material reality as ultimately reducible to a single scale of evaluation or measurement. Reality is henceforth to be known in so far as it is quantifiable. Material reality is presented as having become an object of calculation. The form of reasoning which is adequate to the task of representing reality in this way must be necessarily abstract and formal in character. Its evaluative procedures must, similarly, avoid the inclusion of any unduly restrictive and partial affiliations to any specific component property of the system as a whole if they are to be considered capable of being applicable to the system as a whole. Adorno and Horkheimer present the aspiration towards achieving human sovereignty over nature as culminating in the institution of a mode of reasoning which is bound to the identification and accumulation of facts; which restricts the perceived value of the exercise of reason to one which is instrumental for the domination of nature; and which, finally, aims at the assimilation of all of nature under a single, universalizing representational order. Adorno and Horkheimer present enlightenment as fundamentally driven by the desire to master nature, of bringing all of material reality under a single representational system, within which reason is transformed into a tool for achieving this end. For Adorno and Horkheimer then, nature has been fully mastered within the ‘fully enlightened earth’ and human affairs are regulated and evaluated in accordance with the demands of instrumental reasoning: the means by which nature has been mastered have rebounded upon us. The attempt to fully dominate nature culminates in the institution of a social and political order over which we have lost control. If one wishes to survive, either as an individual or even as a nation, one must conform to, and learn to utilize, instrumental reason. Thought and philosophy aids and abets this order where it seeks merely to mirror or ‘objectively’ reflect that reality.
Adorno aims to avoid providing any such support by, at root, providing a prototypical means of deconstructing that ‘reality’. The radical character of his concept of ‘identity thinking’ consists in its insistence that such ‘objective’ forms of representing reality are not ‘objective’ enough, so to speak. The facts upon which instrumental reasoning goes to work are themselves conceptual abstractions and not direct manifestations of phenomena, as they claim to be. Adorno’s philosophical writings fundamentally aim to demonstrate the two-fold falsity of ‘identity thinking’: first, in respect of debunking the claims of identity thinking to representing reality objectively; second, in respect of the effects of instrumental reasoning as a form of identity thinking upon the potential for the exercise of human freedom. Adorno posits identity thinking as fundamentally concerned not to understand phenomena but to control and manipulate it. A genuinely critical form of philosophy aims to both undercut the dominance of identity thinking and to create an awareness of the potential of apprehending and relating to phenomena in a non-coercive manner. Both how he aims to do this, and how Adorno’s philosophical project can itself be criticized will be considered in the final section. However, having summarized the substance of Adorno’s understanding of philosophy and reason, what must now be considered is the next most important theme addressed in Adorno’s philosophical writings: his vision of the status of morality and moral theory within this fully enlightened earth.
Adorno’s moral philosophy is similarly concerned with the effects of ‘enlightenment’ upon both the prospects of individuals leading a ‘morally good life’ and philosophers’ ability to identify what such a life may consist of. Adorno argues that the instrumentalization of reason has fundamentally undermined both. He argues that social life in modern societies no longer coheres around a set of widely espoused moral truths and that modern societies lack a moral basis. What has replaced morality as the integrating ‘cement’ of social life are instrumental reasoning and the exposure of everyone to the capitalist market. According to Adorno, modern, capitalist societies are fundamentally nihilistic, in character; opportunities for leading a morally good life and even philosophically identifying and defending the requisite conditions of a morally good life have been abandoned to instrumental reasoning and capitalism. Within a nihilistic world, moral beliefs and moral reasoning are held to have no ultimately rational authority: moral claims are conceived of as, at best, inherently subjective statements, expressing not an objective property of the world, but the individual’s own prejudices. Morality is presented as thereby lacking any objective, public basis. The espousal of specific moral beliefs is thus understood as an instrument for the assertion of one’s own, partial interests: morality has been subsumed by instrumental reasoning. Adorno attempts to critically analyse this condition. He is not a nihilist, but a critic of nihilism.
Adorno’s account of nihilism rests, in large part, on his understanding of reason and of how modern societies have come to conceive of legitimate knowledge. He argues that morality has fallen victim to the distinction drawn between objective and subjective knowledge. Objective knowledge consists of empirically verifiable ‘facts’ about material phenomena, whereas subjective knowledge consists of all that remains, including such things as evaluative and normative statements about the world. On this view, a statement such as ‘I am sitting at a desk as I write this essay’ is of a different category to the statement ‘abortion is morally wrong’. The first statement is amenable to empirical verification, whereas the latter is an expression of a personal, subjective belief. Adorno argues that moral beliefs and moral reasoning have been confined to the sphere of subjective knowledge. He argues that, under the force of the instrumentalization of reason and positivism, we have come to conceive of the only meaningfully existing entities as empirically verifiable facts: statements on the structure and content of reality. Moral values and beliefs, in contrast, are denied such a status. Morality is thereby conceived of as inherently prejudicial in character so that, for example, there appears to be no way in which one can objectively and rationally resolve disputes between conflicting substantive moral beliefs and values. Under the condition of nihilism one cannot distinguish between more or less valid moral beliefs and values since the criteria allowing for such evaluative distinctions have been excluded from the domain of subjective knowledge.
Adorno argues that, under nihilistic conditions, morality has become a function or tool of power. The measure of the influence of any particular moral vision is an expression of the material interests that underlie it. Interestingly, Adorno identifies the effects of nihilism as extending to philosophical attempts to rationally defend morality and moral reasoning. Thus, in support of his argument he does not rely upon merely pointing to the extent of moral diversity and conflict in modern societies. Nor does he rest his case upon those who, in the name of some radical account of individual freedom, positively espouse nihilism.
Indeed, he identifies the effects of nihilism within moral philosophy itself, paying particular attention to the moral theory of Immanuel Kant. Adorno argues that Kant’s account of the moral law demonstrates the extent to which morality has been reduced to the status of subjective knowledge. Kant certainly attempts to establish a basis for morality by the exclusion of all substantive moral claims, claims concerning the moral goodness of this or that practice or way of life. Kant ultimately seeks to establish valid moral reasoning upon a series of utterly formal, procedural rules, or maxims which exclude even the pursuit of human happiness as a legitimate component of moral reasoning. Adorno criticizes Kant for emptying the moral law of any and all reference to substantive conceptions of human well-being, or the ‘good life’. Ultimately, Kant is condemned for espousing an account of moral reasoning that is every bit as formal and devoid of any substantively moral constituents as instrumental reasoning. The thrust of Adorno’s criticism of Kant is not so much that Kant developed such an account of morality, since this was, according to Adorno, to a large extent prefigured by the material conditions of Kant’s time and place, but that he both precisely failed to identify the effects of these conditions and, in so doing, thereby failed to discern the extent to which his moral philosophy provides an affirmation, rather than a criticism, of such conditions. Kant, of all people, is condemned for not being sufficiently reflexive.
Unlike some other thinkers and philosophers of the time, Adorno does not think that nihilism can be overcome by a mere act of will or by simply affirming some substantive moral vision of the good life. He does not seek to philosophically circumnavigate the extent to which moral questions concerning the possible nature of the ‘good life’ have become so profoundly problematic for us. Nor does he attempt to provide a philosophical validation of this condition. Recall that Adorno argues that reason has become entwined with domination and has developed as a manifestation of the attempt to control nature. Adorno thus considers nihilism to be a consequence of domination and a testament, albeit in a negative sense, to the extent to which human societies are no longer enthralled by, for example, moral visions grounded in some naturalistic conception of human well-being. For Adorno, this process has been so thorough and complete that we can no longer authoritatively identify the necessary constituents of the good life since the philosophical means for doing so have been vitiated by the domination of nature and the instrumentalization of reason. The role of the critical theorist is, therefore, not to positively promote some alternative, purportedly more just, vision of a morally grounded social and political order. This would too far exceed the current bounds of the potential of reason. Rather, the critical theorist must fundamentally aim to retain and promote an awareness of the contingency of such conditions and the extent to which such conditions are capable of being changed. Adorno’s, somewhat dystopian, account of morality in modern societies follows from his argument that such societies are enthralled by instrumental reasoning and the prioritization of ‘objective facts’. Nihilism serves to fundamentally frustrate the ability of morality to impose authoritative limits upon the application of instrumental reason.
I stated at the beginning of this piece that Adorno was a highly unconventional philosopher. While he wrote volumes on such stock philosophical themes as reason and morality, he also extended his writings and critical focus to include mass entertainment. Adorno analyzed social phenomena as manifestations of domination. For him both the most abstract philosophical text and the most easily consumable film, record, or television show shared this basic similarity. Adorno was a philosopher who took mass entertainment seriously. He was among the first philosophers and intellectuals to recognize the potential social, political, and economic power of the entertainment industry. Adorno saw what he referred to as ‘the culture industry’ as constituting a principal source of domination within complex, capitalist societies. He aims to show that the very areas of life within which many people believe they are genuinely free – free from the demands of work for example – actually perpetuates domination by denying freedom and obstructing the development of a critical consciousness. Adorno’s discussion of the culture industry is unequivocal in its depiction of mass consumer societies as being based upon the systematic denial of genuine freedom. What is the culture industry, and how does Adorno defend his vision of it?
Adorno described the culture industry as a key integrative mechanism for binding individuals, as both consumers and producers, to modern, capitalist societies. Where many sociologists have argued that complex, capitalist societies are fragmented and heterogeneous in character, Adorno insists that the culture industry, despite the manifest diversity of cultural commodities, functions to maintain a uniform system, to which all must conform. David Held, a commentator on critical theory, describes the culture industry thus: “the culture industry produces for mass consumption and significantly contributes to the determination of that consumption. For people are now being treated as objects, machines, outside as well as inside the workshop. The consumer, as the producer, has no sovereignty. The culture industry, integrated into capitalism, in turn integrates consumers from above. Its goal is the production of goods that are profitable and consumable. It operates to ensure its own reproduction.” (1981:91) Few can deny the accuracy of the description of the dominant sectors of cultural production as capitalist, commercial enterprises. The culture industry is a global, multibillion dollar enterprise, driven, primarily, by the pursuit of profit. What the culture industry produces is a means to the generation of profit, like any commercial enterprise.
To this point, few could dispute Adorno’s description of the mass entertainment industry. However, Adorno’s specific notion of the ‘culture industry’ goes much further. Adorno argues that individuals’ integration within the culture industry has the fundamental effect of restricting the development of a critical awareness of the social conditions that confront us all. The culture industry promotes domination by subverting the psychological development of the mass of people in complex, capitalist societies. This is the truly controversial aspect of Adorno’s view of the culture industry. How does he defend it? Adorno argues that cultural commodities are subject to the same instrumentally rationalized mechanical forces which serve to dominate individuals’ working lives. Through our domination of nature and the development of technologically sophisticated forms of productive machinery, we have becomes objects of a system of our own making. Any one who has worked on a production line or in a telephone call centre should have some appreciation of the claim being made. Through the veritably exponential increase in volume and scope of the commodities produced under the auspices of the culture industry, individuals are increasingly subjected to the same underlying conditions through which the complex capitalist is maintained and reproduced. The qualitative distinction between work and leisure, production and consumption is thereby obliterated. As Adorno and Horkheimer assert, “amusement under late capitalism is the prolongation of work. It is sought after as an escape from the mechanized work process, and to recruit strength in order to be able to cope with it again. But at the same time mechanization has such a power over man’s leisure and happiness, and so profoundly determines the manufacture of amusement goods, that his experiences are inevitably after-images of the work process itself.” (1979:137). According to Adorno, systematic exposure to the culture industry (and who can escape from it for long in this media age?) has the fundamental effect of pacifying its consumers. Consumers are presented as being denied any genuine opportunities to actively contribute to the production of the goods to which they are exposed. Similarly, Adorno insists that the form and content of the specific commodities themselves, be it a record, film, or TV show, require no active interpretative role on the part of the consumer: all that is being asked of consumers is that they buy the goods. Adorno locates the origins of the pacifying effects of cultural commodities in what he views as the underlying uniformity of such goods, a uniformity that belies their ostensible differences. Adorno conceives of the culture industry as a manifestation of identity-thinking and as being effected through the implementation of instrumentally rationalized productive techniques. He presents the culture industry as comprising an endless repetition of the same commodified form. He argues that the ostensibly diverse range of commodities produced and consumed under the auspices of the culture industry actually derive from a limited, fundamentally standardized ‘menu’ of interchangeable features and constructs. Thus, he presents the structural properties of the commodities produced and exchanged within the culture industry as being increasingly standardized, formulaic, and repetitive in character. He argues that the standardized character of cultural commodities results from the increasingly mechanized nature of the production, distribution, and consumption of these goods. It is, for example, more economically rational to produce as many products as possible from the same identical ‘mould’. Similarly, the increasing control of distribution centers by large, multinational entertainment conglomerates tends towards a high degree of uniformity.
Adorno’s analyses of specific sectors of the culture industry is extensive in scope. However, his principal area of expertise and interest was music. Adorno analyzed the production and consumption of music as a medium within which one could discern the principal features and effects of the culture industry and the commodification of culture. The central claim underlying Adorno’s analysis of music is that the extension of industrialized production techniques has changed both the structure of musical commodities and the manner in which they are received. Adorno argued that the production of industrialized music is characterized by a highly standardized and uniform menu of musical styles and themes, in accordance with which the commodities are produced. Consistently confronted by familiar and compositionally simplistic musical phenomena requires that the audience need make little interpretative effort in its reception of the product. Adorno presents such musical commodities as consisting of set pieces which elicit set, largely unreflected upon, responses. He states, ‘the counterpart to the fetishism of music is a regression of listening. It is contemporary listening which has regressed, arrested at the infantile stage. Not only do the listening subjects lose, along with freedom of choice and responsibility, the capacity for conscious perception of music, but they stubbornly reject the possibility of such perception. They are not childlike, as might be expected on the basis of an interpretation of the new type of listener in terms of the introduction to musical life of groups previously unacquainted with music. But they are childish; their primitivism is not that of the undeveloped, but that of the forcibly retarded.’ (1978:286). Here Adorno drew upon a distinction previously made by Kant in his formulation of personal autonomy. Distinguishing between maturity and immaturity, Adorno repeats the Kantian claim that to be autonomous is to be mature, capable of exercising one’s own discretionary judgment, of making up one’s own mind for oneself. Adorno argued that the principal effect of the standardization of music is the promotion of a general condition of immaturity, frustrating and prohibiting the exercise of any critical or reflexive faculties in one’s interpretation of the phenomena in question.
Adorno viewed the production and consumption of musical commodities as exemplary of the culture industry in general. However, he also extended his analysis to include other areas of the culture industry, such as television and, even, astrology columns. A brief discussion of this latter will suffice to complete the general contours of Adorno’s account of the culture industry. Adorno conducted a critical textual analysis of the astrology column of the Los Angeles Times. His aim was to identify the ‘rational’ function of the cultural institution itself. He thus took astrology seriously. He considered astrology to be a symptom of complex, capitalist societies and discerned in the widespread appeal of astrology an albeit uncritical and unreflexive awareness of the extent to which individuals’ lives remain fundamentally conditioned by impersonal, external forces, over which individuals have little control. Society is projected, unwittingly, on to the stars. He stated that, “astrology is truly in harmony with a ubiquitous trend. In as much as the social system is the ‘fate’ of most individuals independent of their will and interest, it is projected onto the stars in order thus to obtain a higher degree of dignity and justification in which individuals hope to participate themselves.” (1994:42). According to Adorno, astrology contributes to, and simultaneously reflects, a pervasive fetishistic attitude towards the conditions that actually confront individuals’ lives through the promotion of a vision of human life as being determined by forces beyond our ultimate control. Rather than describing astrology as being irrational in character, Adorno argued that the instrumentally rational character of complex, capitalist societies actually served to lend astrology a degree of rationality in respect of providing individuals with a means for learning to live with conditions beyond their apparent control. He describes astrology as “an ideology for dependence, as an attempt to strengthen and somehow justify painful conditions which seem to be more tolerable if an affirmative attitude is taken towards them.” (1994:115)
For Adorno no single domain of the culture industry is sufficient to ensure the effects he identified as generally exerting upon individuals’ consciousness and lives. However, when taken altogether, the assorted media of the culture industry constitute a veritable web within which the conditions, for example, of leading an autonomous life, for developing the capacity for critical reflection upon oneself and one’s social conditions, are systematically obstructed. According to Adorno, the culture industry fundamentally prohibits the development of autonomy by means of the mediatory role its various sectors play in the formation of individuals’ consciousness of social reality. The form and content of the culture industry is increasingly misidentified as a veritable expression of reality: individuals come to perceive and conceive of reality through the pre-determining form of the culture industry. The culture industry is understood by Adorno to be an essential component of a reified form of second nature, which individuals come to accept as a pre-structured social order, with which they must conform and adapt. The commodities produced by the culture industry may be ‘rubbish’, but their effects upon individuals is deadly serious.
Adorno is widely recognized as one of the leading, but also one of the most controversial continental philosophers of the 20th century. Though largely unappreciated within the analytical tradition of philosophy, Adorno’s philosophical writings have had a significant and lasting effect upon the development of subsequent generations of critical theorists and other philosophers concerned with the general issue of nihilism and domination. Publications on and by Adorno continue to proliferate. Adorno has not been forgotten. His own, uncompromising diagnosis of modern societies and the entwinement of reason and domination continue to resonate and even inspire many working within the continental tradition. However, he has attracted some considerable criticism. I shall briefly consider some of the most pertinent criticisms that have been levelled at Adorno within each of the three areas of his writings I have considered above. I want to begin, though, with some brief comments on Adorno’s writing style.
Adorno can be very difficult to read. He writes in a manner which does not lend itself to ready comprehension. This is intentional. Adorno views language itself as having become an object of, and vehicle for, the perpetuation of domination. He is acutely aware of the extent to which this claim complicates his own work. In attempting to encourage a critical awareness of suffering and domination, Adorno is forced to use the very means by which these conditions are, to a certain extent, sustained. His answer to this problem, although not intended to be ultimately satisfying, is to write in a way that requires hard and concentrated efforts on the part of the reader, to write in a way that explicitly defies convention and the familiar. Adorno aims to encourage his readers to attempt to view the world and the concepts that represent the world in a way that defies identity thinking. He aims, through his writing, to express precisely the unacknowledged, non-identical aspects of any given phenomenon. He aims to show, in a manner very similar to contemporary deconstructionists, the extent to which our linguistic conventions simultaneously both represent and misrepresent reality. In contrast to many deconstructionists, however, Adorno does so in the name of an explicit moral aim and not as a mere literary method. For Adorno, reality is grounded in suffering and the domination of nature. This is a profoundly important distinction. Adorno’s complaint against identity-thinking is a moral and not a methodological one. However, it must be admitted that understanding and evaluating the strengths and weaknesses of Adorno’s philosophical vision is a difficult task. He does not wish to be easily understood in a world in which easy understanding, so he claims, is dependent upon identity-thinking’s falsification of the world.
Adorno’s writing style follows, in large part, from his account of reason. Adorno’s understanding of reason has been subject to consistent criticism. One of the most significant forms of criticism is associated with Jurgen Habermas, arguably the leading contemporary exponent of critical theory. In essence, Habermas (1987) argues that Adorno overestimates the extent to which reason has been instrumentalized within modern, complex societies. For Habermas, instrumental reasoning is only one of a number of forms of reasoning identifiable within such societies. Instrumental reasoning, therefore, is nowhere near as extensive and all-encompassing as Adorno and Horkheimer presented it as being in the Dialectic of Enlightenment. For Habermas, the undue importance attributed to instrumental reasoning has profound moral and philosophical consequences for Adorno’s general vision. Habermas insists that Adorno’s understanding of reason amounts to a renunciation of the moral aims of the Enlightenment, from which critical theory itself appears to take its bearings. There is not doubt that the deployment of technology has had the most horrendous and catastrophic effects upon humanity. However, Habermas argues that these effects are less the consequence of the extension of reason grounded in the domination of nature, as Adorno argues, and more an aberration of enlightenment reason. Adorno is accused of defending an account of instrumental reasoning that is so encompassing and extensive as to exclude the possibility of rationally overcoming these conditions and thereby realizing the aims of critical theory. Adorno is accused of leading critical theory down a moral cul-de-sac. Habermas proceeds to criticize Adorno’s account of reason on philosophical grounds also. He argues, in effect, that Adorno’s account of the instrumentalization of reason is so all encompassing as to exclude the possibility of someone like Adorno presenting a rational and critical analysis of these conditions. Adorno’s critical account of reason seems to logically exclude the possibility of its own existence. Habermas accuses Adorno of having lapsed into a form of performative contradiction. For Habermas, the very fact that a given political or social system is the object of criticism reveals the extent to which the form of domination that Adorno posits has not been fully realized. The fact that Adorno and Horkheimer could proclaim that ‘enlightenment is totalitarian’ amounts to a simultaneous self-refutation. The performance of the claim contradicts its substance. Habermas takes issue with Adorno, finally, on the grounds that Adorno’s account of reason and his advocacy of ‘non-identity thinking’ appear to prohibit critical theory from positively or constructively engaging with social and political injustice. Adorno is accused of adopting the stance of an inveterate ‘nay-sayer’. Being critical can appear as an end in itself, since the very radicalness of Adorno’s diagnosis of reason and modernity appears to exclude the possibility of overcoming domination and heteronomy. Similar criticisms have been leveled at Adorno’s account of morality and his claims in respect of the extent of nihilism. Adorno is consistently accused of failing to appreciate the moral gains achieved as a direct consequence of the formalization of reason and the subsequent demise of the authority of tradition. On this view, attempting to categorize the Marquis de Sade, Kant, and Nietzsche as all similarly expressing and testifying to the ultimate demise of morality, as Adorno and Horkheimer do, is simply false and an example of an apparent tendency to over-generalize in the application of particular concepts.
University of Essex
Last updated: July 20, 2005 | Originally published: