Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Aenesidemus (1st c. CE.)

Aenesidemus was the founder of Pyrrhonian Skepticism. He was born at Gnossus in Crete, but lived at Alexandria and flourished shortly after Cicero. Aenesidemus originally was a member of Plato’s Academy. From the time of Arcesilaus through Carneades, at least, the Academy was skeptical. By the time of Aenesidemus, however, the Academy had splintered into several competing factions and considerably softened or even abandoned its skepticism, as a result of its dialectical interchange with the Stoics. One head of the Academy, Philo, turned to a form of moderate fallibilism, in which one could assent to many beliefs and gain knowledge, although not certainty, while a later head, Antiochus, propounded a dogmatic and syncretistic philosophy, claiming that at bottom Plato, the Stoics, and many other philosophers were really saying the same thing.

Aenesidemus complained that the situation had deteriorated to the point where the Academics were no more than “Stoics in conflict with Stoics,” and he broke with the Academy and founded his own school, taking Pyrrho as its namesake. To strengthen the cause of skepticism, he developed the ten tropes or modes of skepticism—a set of skeptical argument forms, or modes, to show that judgment must be withheld on any issue. All are based on some form of relativity—e.g., the same object can give rise to different perceptions, depending on the bodily condition of the percipient–conjoined with the claim that there is no criterion by which to adjudicate which of the perceptions, customs, etc., are correct. Although Diogenes Laertius attributes the ten modes to Pyrrho, it is likely that they owe their existence to Aenesidemus. Extracts of the ten modes are found in Photius.

Briefly, the ten modes are as follows: (1) The feelings and perceptions of all living beings differ. (2) People have physical and mental differences, which make things appear different to them. (3) The different senses give different impressions of things. (4) Our perceptions depend on our physical and intellectual conditions at the time of perception. (5) Things appear different in different positions, and at different distances. (6) Perception is never direct, but always through a medium. For example, we see things through the air. (7) Things appear different according to variations in their quantity, color, motion, and temperature. (8) A thing impresses us differently when it is familiar and when it is unfamiliar. (9) All supposed knowledge is predication. All predicates give us only the relation of things to other things or to ourselves; they never tell us what the thing in itself is. (10) The opinions and customs of people are different in different countries.

For more information on Aenesidemus, see the section on him in the entry on Ancient Greek Skepticism.

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Last updated: April 25, 2001 | Originally published: