Formalism in aesthetics has traditionally been taken to refer to the view in the philosophy of art that the properties in virtue of which an artwork is an artwork—and in virtue of which its value is determined—are formal in the sense of being accessible by direct sensation (typically sight or hearing) alone.
While such Formalist intuitions have a long history, prominent anti-Formalist arguments towards the end of the twentieth century (for example, from Arthur Danto and Kendall Walton according to which none of the aesthetic properties of a work of art are purely formal) have been taken by many to be decisive. Yet in the early twenty-first century there has been a renewed interest in and defense of Formalism. Contemporary discussion has revealed both “extreme” and more “moderate” positions, but the most notable departure from traditional accounts is the move from Artistic to Aesthetic Formalism.
One might more accurately summarize contemporary Formalist thinking by noting the complaint that prominent anti-Formalist arguments fail to accommodate an important aspect of our aesthetic lives, namely those judgements and experiences (in relation to art, but also beyond the art-world) which should legitimately be referred to as “aesthetic” but which are accessible by direct sensation, and proceed independently of one’s knowledge or appreciation of a thing’s function, history, or context.
The presentation below is divided into five parts. Part 1 outlines an historical overview. It considers some prominent antecedents to Formalist thinking in the nineteenth century, reviews twentieth century reception (including the anti-Formalist arguments that emerged in the latter part of this period), before closing with a brief outline of the main components of the twenty-first century Formalist revival. Part 2 returns to the early part of the twentieth century for a more in-depth exploration of one influential characterisation and defense of Artistic Formalism developed by art-critic Clive Bell in his book Art (1913). Critical reception of Bell’s Formalism has been largely unsympathetic, and some of the more prominent concerns with this view will be discussed here before turning—in Part 3—to the Moderate Aesthetic Formalism developed in the early part of the twenty-first century by Nick Zangwill in his The Metaphysics of Beauty (2001). Part 4 considers the application of Formalist thinking beyond the art world by considering Zangwill’s responses to anti-Formalist arguments regarding the aesthetic appreciation of nature. The presentation closes with a brief conclusion (Part 5) together with references and suggested further reading.
When A. G. Baumgarten introduced the term “aesthetic” into the philosophy of art it seemed to be taken up with the aim of recognising, as well as unifying, certain practices, and perhaps even the concept of beauty itself. It is of note that the phrase l’art pour l’art seemed to gain significance at roughly the same time that the term aesthetic came into wider use.
Much has been done in recognition of the emergence and consolidation of the l’art pour l’art movement which, as well as denoting a self-conscious rebellion against Victorian moralism, has been variously associated with bohemianism and Romanticism and characterises a contention that, for some, encapsulates a central position on art for the main part of the nineteenth century. First appearing in Benjamin Constant’s Journal intime as early as 1804 under a description of Schiller’s aesthetics, the initial statement: “L’art pour l’art without purpose, for all purpose perverts art” has been taken not only as a synonym for the disinterestedness reminiscent of Immanuel Kant’s aesthetic but as a modus operandi in its own right for a particular evaluative framework and corresponding practice of those wishing to produce and insomuch define the boundaries of artistic procedure.
These two interpretations are related insofar as it is suggested that the emergence of this consolidated school of thought takes its initial airings from a superficial misreading of Kant’s Critique of Judgement (a connection we will return to in Part 3). Kant’s Critique was not translated into French until 1846, long after a number of allusions that implicate an understanding and certainly a derivation from Kant’s work. John Wilcox (1953) describes how early proponents, such as Victor Cousin, spoke and wrote vicariously of Kant’s work or espoused positions whose Kantian credentials can be—somewhat undeservedly it turns out—implicated. The result was that anyone interested in the arts in the early part of the nineteenth century would be exposed to a new aesthetic doctrine whose currency involved variations on terms including aesthetic, disinterest, free, beauty, form and sublime.
By the 1830s, a new school of aesthetics thus accessed the diluted Kantian notions of artistic genius giving form to the formless, presented in Scheller’s aesthetics, via the notion of beauty as disinterested sensual pleasure, found in Cousin and his followers, towards an understanding of a disinterested emotion which constitutes the apprehension of beauty. All or any of which could be referred to by the expression L’art pour l’art; all of which became increasingly associated with the term aesthetic.
Notable adoption, and thus identification with what may legitimately be referred to as this “school of thought” included Victor Hugo, whose preface to Cromwell, in 1827, went on to constitute a manifesto for the French Romantic movement and certainly gave support to the intuitions at issue. Théophile Gautier, recognising a theme in Hugo, promoted a pure art-form less constrained by religious, social or political authority. In the preface to his Premières poesies (1832) he writes: “What [end] does this [book] serve? – it serves by being beautiful… In general as soon as something becomes useful it ceases to be beautiful”. This conflict between social usefulness versus pure art also gained, on the side of the latter, an association with Walter Pater whose influence on the English Aesthetic movement blossomed during the 1880s where the adoption of sentimental archaism as the ideal of beauty was carried to extravagant lengths. Here associations were forged with the likes of Oscar Wilde and Arthur Symons, further securing (though not necessarily promoting) a connection with aestheticism in general. Such recognition would see the influence of l’art pour l’art stretch well beyond the second half of the nineteenth century.
As should be clear from this brief outline it is not at all easy, nor would it be appropriate, to suggest the emergence of a strictly unified school of thought. There are at least two strands that can be separated in what has been stated so far. At one extreme we can identify claims like the following from the preface of Wilde’s The Picture of Dorian Gray: “There is no such thing as a moral or an immoral book. Books are well written or badly written.” Here the emphasis is initially on the separation of the value of art from social or moral aims and values. The sentiment is clearly reminiscent of Gautier’s claim: “Only those things that are altogether useless can be truly beautiful; anything that is useful is ugly; for it is the expression of some need…”. Yet for Wilde, and many others, the claim was taken more specifically to legitimise the production and value of amoral, or at least morally controversial, works.
In a slightly different direction (although recognisably local to the above), one might cite James Whistler: Art should be independent of all claptrap—should stand alone […] and appeal to the artistic sense of eye or ear, without confounding this with emotions entirely foreign to it, in devotion, pity, love, patriotism and the like.
While the second half of this statement seems merely to echo the sentiments expressed by Wilde in the same year, there is, in the first half, recognition of the contention Whistler was later to voice with regard to his painting; one that expressed a focus, foremost, on the arrangement of line, form and colour in the work. Here we see an element of l’art pour l’art that anticipated the importance of formal features in the twentieth century, holding that artworks contain all the requisite value inherently—they do not need to borrow significance from biographical, historical, psychological or sociological sources. This line of thought was pursued, and can be identified, in Eduard Hanslick’s The Beautiful in Music (1891); Clive Bell’s Art (1913); and Roger Fry’s Vision and Design (1920). The ruminations of which are taken to have given justification to various art movements from abstract, non-representational art, through Dada, Surrealism, Cubism.
While marked here as two separable strands, a common contention can be seen to run through the above intuitions; one which embarks from, but preserves, something of the aesthetic concept of disinterestedness, which Kant expressed as purposiveness without purpose. L’art pour l’art can be seen to encapsulate a movement that swept through Paris and England in the form of the new Aesthetic (merging along the way with the Romantic Movement and bohemianism), but also the central doctrine that formed not only the movement itself, but a well-established tradition in the history of aesthetics. L’art pour l’art captures not just a movement but an aesthetic theory; one that was adopted and defended by both critics and artists as they shaped art history itself.
Towards the end of the twentieth century Leonard Meyer (in Dutton, 1983) characterised the intuition that we should judge works of art on the basis of their intrinsic formal qualities alone as a “common contention” according to which the work of art is said to have its complete meaning “within itself”. On this view, cultural and stylistic history, and the genesis of the artwork itself do not enhance true understanding. Meyer even suggests that the separation of the aesthetic from religion, politics, science and so forth, was anticipated (although not clearly distinguished) in Greek thought. It has long been recognised that aesthetic behaviour is different from ordinary behaviour; however, Meyer goes on to argue that this distinction has been taken too far. Citing the Artistic Formalism associated with Clive Bell (see Part 2), he concludes that in actual practice we do not judge works of art in terms of their intrinsic formal qualities alone.
However, Artistic Formalism, or its close relatives, have met with serious (or potentially disabling) opposition of the kind found in Meyer. Gregory Currie (1989) and David Davies (2004) both illustrate a similar disparity between our actual critical and appreciative practices and what is (in the end) suggested to be merely some pre-theoretical intuition. Making such a point in his An Ontology of Art, Currie draws together a number of familiar and related aesthetic stances under the term “Aesthetic Empiricism”, according to which
[T]he boundaries of the aesthetic are set by the boundaries of vision, hearing or verbal understanding, depending on which art form is in question. (Currie, 1989, p.18)
Currie asserts that empiricism finds its natural expression in aesthetics in the view that a work—a painting, for instance—is a “sensory surface”. Such a view was, according to Currie, supposed by David Prall when he said that “Cotton will suffice aesthetically for snow, provided that at our distance from it it appears snowy”. It is the assumption we recover from Monroe Beardsley (1958) in the view that the limits of musical appreciation are the limits of what can be heard in a work. Currie also recognises a comparable commitment concerning literature in Wimsatt and Beardsley’s The Intentional Fallacy (1946). We can add to Currie’s list Clive Bell’s claim that
To appreciate a work of art we need bring with us nothing from life, no knowledge of its ideas and affairs, no familiarity with its emotions… we need bring with us nothing but a sense of form and colour and a knowledge of three-dimensional space.
Alfred Lessing, in his “What is Wrong with Forgery?” (in Dutton, 1983), argues that on the assumption that an artwork is a “sensory surface” it does seem a natural extension to claim that what is aesthetically valuable in a painting is a function solely of how it looks. This “surface” terminology, again, relates back to Prall who characterised the aesthetic in terms of an exclusive interest in the “surface” of things, or the thing as seen, heard, felt, immediately experienced. It echoes Fry’s claim that aesthetic interest is constituted only by an awareness of “order and variety in the sensuous plane”. However, like Kendall Walton (1970) and Arthur Danto (1981) before him, Currie’s conclusion is that this common and influential view is nonetheless false.
Walton’s anti-formalism is presented in his essay “Categories of Art” in which he first argues that the aesthetic properties one perceives an artwork as having will depend on which category one perceives the work as belonging to (for example, objects protruding from a canvas seen under the category of “painting”—rather than under the category of “collage”—may appear contrary to expectation and thus surprising, disturbing, or incongruous). Secondly, Walton argues that the aesthetic properties an artwork actually has are those it is perceived as having when seen under the category to which it actually belongs. Determination of “correct” categories requires appeal to such things as artistic intentions, and as knowledge concerning these requires more than a sense of form, color, and knowledge of three-dimensional space, it follows that Artistic Formalism must be false (see Part 3 for a more in-depth discussion of Walton’s anti-formalist arguments).
Similarly, Danto’s examples—these include artworks such as Marcel Duchamp’s “Readymades”, Andy Warhol’s Brillo Boxes, and Danto’s hypothetical set of indiscernible red squares that constitute distinct artworks with distinct aesthetic properties (indeed, two of which are not artworks at all but “mere things”)—are generally taken to provide insurmountable difficulties for traditional Artistic Formalism. Danto argues that, regarding most artworks, it is possible to imagine two objects that are formally or perceptually indistinguishable but differ in artistic value, or perhaps are not artworks at all.
Despite the prominence of these anti-formalist arguments, there has been some notable resistance from the Formalist camp. In 1983 Denis Dutton published a collection of articles on forgery and the philosophy of art under the title The Forger’s Art. Here, in an article written for the collection, Jack Meiland argues that the value of originality in art is not an aesthetic value. In criticism of the (above) position held by Leonard Meyer, who defends the value of originality in artworks, Meiland asks whether the original Rembrandt has greater aesthetic value than the copy? He refers to “the appearance theory of aesthetic value” according to which aesthetic value is independent of the non-visual properties of the work of art, such as its historical properties. On this view, Meiland argues, the copy, being visually indistinguishable from the original, is equal in aesthetic value. Indeed, he points to an arguable equivocation in the sense of the word “original” or “originality”. The originality of the work will be preserved in the copy—it is rather the level of creativity that may be surrendered. We might indeed take the latter to devalue the copied work, but Meiland argues that while originality is a feature of a work, creativity is a feature applicable to the artist or in this case a feature lacking in the copyist, it therefore cannot affect the aesthetic quality of the work. Thus we cannot infer from the lack of creativity on the part of the artist that the work itself lacks originality.
This distinction between “artistic” and “aesthetic” value marks the transition from Artistic to Aesthetic Formalism. Danto, for example, actually endorsed a version of the latter in maintaining that (while indistinguishable objects may differ in terms of their artistic value or art-status) in being perceptually indiscernible, two objects would be aesthetically indiscernible also. Hence, at its strongest formulation Aesthetic Formalism distinguishes aesthetic from non-aesthetic value whilst maintaining that the former is restricted to those values that can be detected merely by attending to what can be seen, heard, or immediately experienced. Values not discerned in this way may be important, but should not be thought of as (purely) “aesthetic” values.
Nick Zangwill (2001) has developed a more moderate Aesthetic Formalism, drawing on the Kantian distinction between free (formal) and dependent (non-formal) beauty. In relation to the value of art, Zangwill accepts that “extreme formalism” (according to which all the aesthetic properties of a work of art are formal) is false. But so too are strongly anti-Formalist positions such as those attributable to Walton, Danto, and Currie (according to which none of the aesthetic properties of a work of art are purely formal). Whilst conceding that the restrictions imposed by Formalism on those features of an artwork available for consideration are insufficient to deliver some aesthetic judgements that are taken to be central to the discourse, Zangwill maintains that there is nonetheless an “important truth” in formalism. Many artworks have a mix of formal and non-formal aesthetic properties, and at least some artworks have only formal aesthetic properties. Moreover, this insight from the Aesthetic Formalisist is not restricted to the art world. Many non-art objects also have important formal aesthetic properties. Zangwill even goes so far as to endorse extreme Aesthetic Formalism about inorganic natural items (such as rocks and sunsets).
In Part 1 we noted the translation of the L’art pour l’art stance onto pictorial art with reference to Whistler’s appeal to “the artistic sense of eye and ear”. Many of the accounts referred to above focus on pictorial artworks and the specific response that can be elicited by these. Here in particular it might be thought that Bell’s Artistic Formalism offers a position that theoretically consolidates the attitudes described.
Formalism of this kind has received largely unsympathetic treatment for its estimation that perceptual experience of line and colour is uniquely and properly the domain of the aesthetic. Yet there is some intuitive plausibility to elements of the view Bell describes which have been preserved in subsequent attempts to re-invigorate an interest in the application of formalism to aesthetics (see Part 3). In this section we consider Bell’s initial formulation, identifying (along the way) those themes that re-emerge in contemporary discussion.
The claim under consideration is that in pictorial art (if we may narrow the scope for the purposes of this discussion) a work’s value is a function of its beauty and beauty is to be found in the formal qualities and arrangement of paint on canvas. Nothing more is required to judge the value of a work. Here is Bell:
What quality is shared by all objects that provoke our aesthetic emotions? What quality is common to Sta. Sophia and the windows at Chartres, Mexican sculpture, a Persian bowl, Chinese carpets, Giotto’s frescoes at Padua, and the masterpieces of Poussin, Piero della Francesca, and Cezanne? Only one answer seems possible – significant form. In each, lines and colours combined in a particular way, certain forms and relations of forms, stir our aesthetic emotions. These relations and combinations of lines and colours, these aesthetically moving forms, I call “Significant Form”; and “Significant Form” is the one quality common to all works of visual art. (1913, p.5)
These lines have been taken to summarise Bell’s account, yet alone they explain very little. One requires a clear articulation of what “aesthetic emotions” are, and what it is to have them stirred. Also it seems crucial to note that for Bell we have no other means of recognising a work of art than our feeling for it. The subjectivity of such a claim is, for Bell, to be maintained in any system of aesthetics. Furthermore it is the exercise of bringing the viewer to feel the aesthetic emotion (combined with an attempt to account for the degree of aesthetic emotion experienced) that constitutes the function of criticism. “…[I]t is useless for a critic to tell me that something is a work of art; he must make me feel it for myself. This he can do only by making me see; he must get at my emotions through my eyes.” Without such an emotional attachment the subject will be in no position to legitimately attribute to the object the status of artwork.
Unlike the proponents of the previous century Bell is not so much claiming an ought (initially) but an is. Significant form must be the measure of artistic value as it is the only thing that all those works we have valued through the ages have in common. For Bell we have no other means of recognising a work of art than our feeling for it. If a work is unable to engage our feelings it fails, it is not art. If it engages our feelings, but feelings that are sociologically contingent (for example, certain moral sensibilities that might be diminished or lost over time), it is not engaging aesthetic sensibilities and, inasmuch, is not art. Thus if a work is unable to stir the viewer in this precise and uncontaminated way (in virtue of its formal qualities alone), it will be impossible to ascribe to the object the status of artwork.
We are, then, to understand that certain forms—lines, colours, in particular combinations—are de facto producers of some kind of aesthetic emotion. They are in this sense “significant” in a manner that other forms are not. Without exciting aesthetic rapture, although certain forms may interest us; amuse us; capture our attention, the object under scrutiny will not be a work of art. Bell tells us that art can transport us
[F]rom the world of man’s activity to a world of aesthetic exaltation. For a moment we are shut off from human interests; our anticipations and memories are arrested; we are lifted above the stream of life. The pure mathematician rapt in his studies knows a state of mind which I take to be similar if not identical.
Thus the significance in question is a significance unrelated to the significance of life. “In this [the aesthetic] world the emotions of life find no place. It is a world with emotions of its own.” Bell writes that before feeling an aesthetic emotion one perceives the rightness and necessity of the combination of form at issue, he even considers whether it is this, rather than the form itself, that provokes the emotion in question. Bell’s position appears to echo G. E. Moore’s intuitionism in the sense that one merely contemplates the object and recognises the significant form that constitutes its goodness.
But the spectator is not required to know anything more than that significant form is exhibited. Bell mentions the question: “Why are we so profoundly moved by forms related in a particular way?” yet dismisses the matter as extremely interesting but irrelevant to aesthetics. Bell’s view is that for “pure aesthetics” we need only consider our emotion and its object—we do not need to “pry behind the object into the state of mind of him who made it.” For pure aesthetics, then, it need only be agreed that certain forms do move us in certain ways, it being the business of an artist to arrange forms such that they so move us.
Central to Bell’s account was a contention that the response elicited in the apprehension of significant form is one incomparable with the emotional responses of the rest of experience. The world of human interests and emotions do, of course, temper a great deal of our interactions with valuable objects, these can be enjoyable and beneficial, but constitute impure appreciation. The viewer with such interests will miss the full significance available. He or she will not get the best that art can give. Bell is scathing of the mistaken significance that can be attributed to representational content, this too signifies impure appreciation. He suggests that those artists “too feeble to create forms that provoke more than a little aesthetic emotion will try to eke that little out by suggesting the emotions of life”. Such interests betray a propensity in artists and viewers to merely bring to art and take away nothing more than the ideas and associations of their own age or experience. Such prima facie significance is the significance of a defective sensibility. As it depends only on what one can bring to the object, nothing new is added to one’s life in its apprehension. For Bell, then, significant form is able to carry the viewer out of life and into ecstasy. The true artist is capable of feeling such emotion, which can be expressed only in form; it is this that the subject apprehends in the true artwork.
Much visual art is concerned with the physical world—whatever the emotion the artists express may be, it seemingly comes through the contemplation of the familiar. Bell is careful to state, therefore, that this concern for the physical world can be (or should be) nothing over and above a concern for the means to the inspired emotional state. Any other concerns, such as practical utility, are to be ignored by art. With this claim Bell meant to differentiate the use of artworks for documentary, educational, or historical purposes. Such attentions lead to a loss of the feeling of emotions that allow one to get to the thing in itself. These are interests that come between things and our emotional reaction to them. In this area Bell is dismissive of the practice of intellectually carving up our environment into practically identified individuations. Such a practice is superficial in requiring our contemplation only to the extent to which an object is to be utilised. It marks a habit of recognising the label and overlooking the thing, and is indicative of a visual shallowness that prohibits the majority of us from seeing “emotionally” and from grasping the significance of form.
Bell holds that the discerning viewer is concerned only with line and colour, their relations and qualities, the apprehension of which (in significant form) can allow the viewer an emotion more powerful, profound, and genuinely significant than can be afforded by any description of facts or ideas. Thus, for Bell:
Great art remains stable and unobscure because the feelings that it awakens are independent of time and place, because its kingdom is not of this world. To those who have and hold a sense of the significance of form what does it matter whether the forms that move them were created in Paris the day before yesterday or in Babylon fifty centuries ago. The forms of art are inexhaustible; but all lead by the same road of aesthetic emotion to the same world of aesthetic ecstasy. (1913, p.16)
What Bell seems to be pushing for is a significance that will not be contingent on peculiarities of one age or inclination, and it is certainly interesting to see what a pursuit of this characteristic can yield. However, it is unclear why one may only reach this kind of significance by looking to emotions that are (in some sense) out of this world. Some have criticised Bell on his insistence that aesthetic emotion could be a response wholly separate from the rest of a person’s emotional character. Thomas McLaughlin (1977) claims that there could not be a pure aesthetic emotion in Bell’s sense, arguing that the aesthetic responses of a spectator are influenced by her normal emotional patterns. On this view the spectator’s emotions, including moral reactions, are brought directly into play under the control of the artist’s technique. It is difficult to deny that the significance, provocativeness and interest in many works of art do indeed require the spectator to bring with them their worldly experiences and sensibilities. John Carey (2005) is equally condemning of Bell’s appeal to the peculiar emotion provided by works of art. He is particularly critical of Bell’s contention that the same emotion could be transmitted between discreet historical periods (or between artist and latter-day spectator). On the one hand, Bell could not possibly know he is experiencing the same emotion as the Chaldean four thousand years earlier, but more importantly to experience the same emotion one would have to share the same unconscious, to have undergone the same education, to have been shaped by the same emotional experiences.
It is important to note that such objections are not entirely decisive. Provocativeness in general and indeed any interests of this kind are presumably ephemeral qualities of a work. These are exactly the kinds of transitory evaluations that Bell was keen to sidestep in characterising true works and the properties of lasting value. The same can be said for all those qualities that are only found in a work in virtue of the spectator’s peculiar education and emotional experience. Bell does acknowledge such significances but doesn’t give to them the importance that he gives to formal significance. It is when we strip away the interests, educations, and the provocations of a particular age that we get to those works that exhibit lasting worth. Having said that, there is no discernible argument in support of the claim that the lasting worth Bell attempts to isolate should be taken to be more valuable, more (or genuinely) significant than the kinds of ephemeral values he dismisses. Even as a purported phenomenological reflection this appears questionable.
In discussion of much of the criticism Bell’s account has received it is important not to run together two distinct questions. On the one hand there is the question of whether or not there exists some emotion that is peculiar to the aesthetic; that is “otherworldly” in the sense that it is not to be confused with those responses that temper the rest of our lives. The affirmation of this is certainly implicated in Bell’s account and is rightly met with some consternation. But what is liable to become obscured is that the suggestion of such an inert aesthetic emotion was part of Bell’s solution to the more interesting question with which his earlier writing was concerned. This question concerns whether or not one might isolate a particular reaction to certain (aesthetic) objects that is sufficiently independent of time, place and enculturation that one might expect it to be exhibited in subjects irrespective of their historical and social circumstance.
One response to this question is indeed to posit an emotional response that is unlike all those responses that are taken to be changeable and contingent on time, culture and so forth. Looking at the changeable interests of the art-world over time, one might well see that an interest in representation or subject matter betrays the spectator’s allegiance to “the gross herd” (as Bell puts it) of some era. But it seems this response is unsatisfactory. As we have seen, McLaughlin and Carey are sceptical of the kind of inert emotion Bell stipulates. Bell’s response to such criticisms is to claim that those unable to accept the postulation are simply ignorant of the emotion he describes. While this is philosophically unsatisfactory the issue is potentially moot. Still, it might be thought that there are other ways in which one might characterise lasting value such as to capture the kind of quality Bell pursued whilst dismissing the more ephemeral significances that affect a particular time.
Regarding the second question, it is tempting to see something more worthwhile in Bell’s enterprise. There is at least some prima facie attraction to Bell’s response, for, assuming that one is trying to distinguish art from non-art, if one hopes to capture something stable and unobscure in drawing together all those things taken to be art, one might indeed look to formal properties of works and one will (presumably) only include those works from any time that do move us in the relevant respect. What is lacking in Bell’s account is some defense of the claim, firstly that those things that move Bell are the domain of true value, and secondly that we should be identifying something stable and unobscure. Why should we expect to identify objects of antiquity as valuable artworks on the basis of their stirring our modern dispositions (excepting the claim—Bell’s claim—that such dispositions are not modern at all but timeless)? Granted, there are some grounds for pursuing the kind of account Bell offers, particularly if one is interested in capturing those values that stand the test of time. However, Bell appears to motivate such a pursuit by making a qualitative claim that such values are in some way more significant, more valuable than those he rejects. And it is difficult to isolate any argument for such a claim.
The central line of Bell’s account that appears difficult to accept is that while one might be able to isolate a specifically perceptual response to artworks, it seems that one could only equate this response with all that is valuable in art if one were able to qualify the centrality of this response to the exclusion of others. This presentation will not address (as some critics do) the question of whether such a purely aesthetic response can be identified; this must be addressed if anything close to Bell’s account is to be pursued. But for the time being all one need acknowledge is that the mere existence of this response is not enough to legitimise the work Bell expected it to do. A further argument is required to justify a thesis that puts formal features (or our responses to these) at centre stage.
Yet aside from this aim there are some valuable mechanisms at work in Bell’s theory. As a corollary of his general stance, Bell mentions that to understand art we do not need to know anything about art-history. It may be that from works of art we can draw inferences as to the sort of people who made them; but an intimate understanding of an artist will not tell us whether his pictures are any good. This point again relates to Bell’s contention that pure aesthetics is concerned only with the question of whether or not objects have a specific emotional significance to us. Other questions, he believes, are not questions for aesthetics:
To appreciate a man’s art I need know nothing whatever about the artist; I can say whether this picture is better than that without the help of history, but if I am trying to account for the deterioration of his art, I shall be helped by knowing that he has been seriously ill… To mark the deterioration was to make a pure, aesthetic judgement: to account for it was to become an historian. (1913, pp.44-5, emphasis added)
The above passage illustrates an element of Bell’s account some subsequent thinkers have been keen to preserve. Bell holds that attributing value to a work purely on the basis of the position it holds within an art-historical tradition, (because it is by Picasso, or marks the advent of cubism) is not a pursuit of aesthetics. Although certain features and relations may be interesting historically, aesthetically these can be of no consequence. Indeed valuing an object because it is old, interesting, rare, or precious can over-cloud one’s aesthetic sensibility and puts one at a disadvantage compared to the viewer who knows and cares nothing of the object under consideration. Representation is, also, nothing to do with art’s value according to Bell. Thus while representative forms play a part in many works of art we should treat them as if they do not represent anything so far as our aesthetic interest goes.
It is fairly well acknowledged that Bell had a non-philosophical agenda for these kinds of claims. It is easy to see in Bell a defense of the value of abstract art over other art forms and this was indeed his intention. The extent to which Renaissance art can be considered great, for example, has nothing to do with representational accuracy but must be considered only in light of the formal qualities exhibited. In this manner many of the values formerly identified in artworks, and indeed movements, would have to be dismissed as deviations from the sole interest of the aesthetic: the pursuit of significant form.
There is a sense in which we should not underplay the role of the critic or philosopher who should be capable of challenging our accepted practices; capable of refining or cultivating our tastes. To this end Bell’s claims are not out of place. However, while there is some tendency to reflect upon purely formal qualities of a work of art rather than artistic technique or various associations; while there is a sense in which many artists attempt to depict something beyond the evident (utility driven) perceptual shallowness that can dictate our perceptual dealings, it remains obscure why this should be our only interest. Unfortunately, the exclusionary nature of Bell’s account seems only to be concerned with the aesthetic narrowly conceived, excluding any possibility of the development of, or importance of, other values and interests, both as things stand and in future artistic development. Given the qualitative claim Bell demands concerning the superior value of significant form this appears more and more troubling with the increasing volume of works (and indeed values) that would have to be ignored under Bell’s formulation.
As a case in point (perhaps a contentious one but there are any number of related examples), consider Duchamp’s Fountain (1917). In line with much of the criticism referred to in Part 1, the problem is that because Bell identifies aesthetic value (as he construes it) with “art-hood” itself, Artistic Formalism has nothing to say about a urinal that purports to be anti-aesthetic and yet art. Increasingly, artworks are recognised as such and valued for reasons other than the presence (or precisely because of their lack) of aesthetic properties, or exhibited beauty. The practice continues, the works are criticised and valued, and formalists of this kind can do very little but stamp their feet. The death of Artistic Formalism is apparently heralded by the departure of practice from theory.
So what are we to take from Bell’s account? His claims that our interactions with certain artworks yield an emotion peculiar to the aesthetic, and not experienced in our everyday emotional lives, is rightly met with consternation. It is unclear why we should recognise such a reaction to be of a different kind (let alone a more valuable kind) to those experienced in other contexts such as to discount many of our reactions to ostensible aesthetic objects as genuine aesthetic responses. Few are prompted by Bell’s account to accept this determination of the aesthetic nor does it seem to satisfactorily capture all that we should want to in this area. However, Bell’s aim in producing this theory was (ostensibly) to capture something common to aesthetic objects. In appealing to a timeless emotion that will not be subject to the contingencies of any specific era, Bell seemingly hoped to account for the enduring values of works throughout time. It is easy enough to recognise this need and the place Bell’s theory is supposed to hold in satisfying what does appear to be a sensible requirement. It is less clear that this path, if adequately pursued, should be found to be fruitless.
That we should define the realm of the aesthetic in virtue of those works that stand the test of time has been intuitive to some; how else are we to draw together all those objects worthy of theoretical inclusion whilst characterising and discounting failed works, impostors, and anomalies? Yet there is something disconcerting about this procedure. That we should ascribe the label “art” or even “aesthetic” to a conjunction of objects that have, over time, continued to impress on us some valuable property, seems to invite a potentially worrying commitment to relativity. The preceding discussion has given some voice to a familiar enough contention that by indexing value to our current sensibility we stand to dismiss things that might have been legitimately valued in the past. Bell’s willingness to acknowledge, even rally for, the importance of abstract art leads him to a theory that identifies the value of works throughout history only on the basis of their displaying qualities (significant form) that he took to be important. The cost (although for Bell this is no cost) of such a theory is that things like representational dexterity (a staple of the Renaissance) must be struck from the list of aesthetically valuable properties, just as the pursuit of such a quality by artists must be characterised as misguided.
The concern shared by those who criticise Bell seems to stem from an outlook according to which any proposed theory should be able to capture and accommodate the moving trends, interests and evaluations that constitute art history and drive the very development of artistic creation. This is what one expects an art theory to be able to do. This is where Artistic Formalism fails, as art-practice and art theory diverge. Formalism, as a theory of art, is ill suited to make ontological distinctions between genuine- and non-art. A theory whose currency is perceptually available value will be ill-equipped to officiate over a practice that is governed by, amongst other things, institutional considerations; in fact a practice that is able to develop precisely by identifying recognised values and then subverting them. For these reasons it seems obvious that Formalism is not a bad theory of art but is no theory of art at all.
This understood, one can begin to see those elements of Bell’s Formalism that may be worth salvaging and those that must be rejected. For instance, Bell ascribes a particular domain to aesthetic judgements, reactions, and evaluations such as to distinguish a number of other pronouncements that can also be made in reference to the object in question (some, perhaps, deserve to be labelled “aesthetic” but some—arguably—do not). Bell can say of Picasso’s Guernica (1937) that the way it represents and expresses various things about the Spanish Civil War might well be politically and historically interesting (and valuable)—and might lead to the ascription of various properties to the work (being moving, or harsh). Likewise, the fact that it is by Picasso (or is a genuine Picasso rather than a forgery) will be of interest to some and might also lead to the ascription of certain properties. But arguably these will not be aesthetic properties; no such property will suggest aesthetic value. Conversely, the fact that a particular object is a fake is often thought to devalue the work; for many it may even take away the status of work-hood. But for Bell if the object were genuinely indistinguishable from the original, then it will be capable of displaying the same formal relations and will thus exhibit equal aesthetic value. It is this identification of aesthetic value with formal properties of the work that appears—for some—to continue to hold some plausibility.
However, there have been few (if any) sympathisers towards Bell’s insistence that only if something displayed value in virtue of its formal features would it count as art, or as valuable in an aesthetic. A more moderate position would be to ascribe a particular domain to formal aesthetic judgements, reactions and evaluations, while distinguishing these from both non-formal aesthetic judgements, and non-aesthetic (for example, artistic, political, historical) judgements. On this kind of approach, Bell’s mistake was two-fold: Bell ran into difficulties when he (1) attempted to tie Formalism to the nature of art itself, and (2) restricted the aesthetic exclusively to a formal conception of beauty.
By construing formalism as an aesthetic theory (as an account of what constitutes aesthetic value) or as part of an aesthetic theory (as an account of one kind of aesthetic value), whilst at the same time admitting that there are other values to be had (both aesthetic and non-aesthetic), the Formalist needn’t go so far as to ordain the priority or importance of this specific value in the various practices in which it features. In this way, one can anticipate the stance of the Moderate Formalist who asserts (in terms reminiscent of Kant’s account) there to be two kinds of beauty: formal beauty, and non-formal beauty. Formal beauty is an aesthetic property that is entirely determined by “narrow” non-aesthetic properties (these include sensory and non-relational physical properties such as the lines and colours on the surface of a painting). Non-formal beauty is determined by “broad” non-aesthetic properties (which covers anything else, including appeals to the content-related aspects that would be required to ascertain the aptness or suitability of certain features for the intended end of the painting, or the accuracy of a representational portrait, or the category to which an artwork belongs).
While these notions require much clarification (see Part 3), a useful way to express the aspirations of this account would be to note that the Moderate Formalist claims that their metaphysical stance generates the only theory capable of accommodating the aesthetic properties of all works of art. Unlike Bell’s “extreme Formalism”, maintaining all aesthetic properties to be narrowly determined by sensory and intrinsic physical properties; and unlike “anti-Formalism”, according to which all aesthetic properties are at least partly determined by broad non-aesthetic properties such as the artist’s intentions, or the artwork’s history of production; the Moderate Formalist insists that, in the context of the philosophy of art, many artworks have a mix of formal and non-formal aesthetic properties; that others have only non-formal aesthetic properties; and that at least some artworks have only formal aesthetic properties.
The issue of formalism is introduced on the assumption that aesthetic properties are determined by certain non-aesthetic properties; versions of formalism differ primarily in their answers to the question of which non-aesthetic properties are of interest. This part of the presentation briefly outlines the central characterisations of “form” (and their differences) that will be pertinent to an understanding of twenty-first century discussions of Formalism. For present purposes, and in light of the previous discussion, it will be satisfactory to focus on formal characterisations of artworks and, more specifically visual art.
Nick Zangwill recognises that arrangements of lines, shapes, and colours (he includes “shininess” and “glossiness” as colour properties) are typically taken as formal properties, contrasting these with non-formal properties which are determined, in part, by the history of production or context of creation for the artwork. In capturing this divide, he writes:
The most straightforward account would be to say that formal properties are those aesthetic properties that are determined solely by sensory or physical properties—so long as the physical properties in question are not relations to other things or other times. This would capture the intuitive idea that formal properties are those aesthetic properties that are directly perceivable or that are determined by properties that are directly perceivable. (2001, p.56)
Noting that this will not accommodate the claims of some philosophers that aesthetic properties are “dispositions to provoke responses in human beings”, Zangwill stipulates the word “narrow” to include sensory properties, non-relational physical properties, and dispositions to provoke responses that might be thought part-constitutive of aesthetic properties; the word “broad” covers anything else (such as the extrinsic property of the history of production of a work). We can then appeal to a basic distinction: “Formal properties are entirely determined by narrow nonaesthetic properties, whereas nonformal aesthetic properties are partly determined by broad nonaesthetic properties.” (2001, p.56)
On this basis, Zangwill identifies Extreme Formalism as the view that all aesthetic properties of an artwork are formal (and narrowly determined), and Anti-Formalism as the view that no aesthetic properties of an artwork are formal (all are broadly determined by history of production as well as narrow non-aesthetic properties). His own view is a Moderate Formalism, holding that some aesthetic properties of an artwork are formal, others are not. He motivates this view via a number of strategies but in light of earlier parts of this discussion it will be appropriate to focus on Zangwill’s responses to those arguments put forward by the anti-formalist.
Part 1 briefly considersed Kendall Walton’s influential position according to which in order to make any aesthetic judgement regarding a work of art one must see it under an art-historical category. This claim was made in response to various attempts to “purge from criticism of works of art supposedly extraneous excursions into matters not (or not “directly”) available to inspection of the works, and to focus attention on the works themselves” (See, for example, the discussion of Clive Bell in Part 2). In motivating this view Walton offers what he supposes to be various “intuition pumps” that should lead to the acceptance of his proposal.
In defense of a moderate formalist view Nick Zangwill has asserted that Walton’s thesis is at best only partly accurate. For Zangwill, there is a large and significant class of works of art and aesthetic properties of works of art that are purely formal; in Walton’s terms the aesthetic properties of these objects emerge from the “configuration of colours and shapes on a painting” alone. This would suggest a narrower determination of those features of a work “available to inspection” than Walton defends in his claim that the history of production (a non-formal feature) of a work partly determines its aesthetic properties by determining the category to which the work belongs and must be perceived. Zangwill wants to resist Walton’s claim that all or most works and values are category-dependent; aiming to vindicate the disputed negative thesis that “the application of aesthetic concepts to a work of art can leave out of consideration facts about its origin”. Zangwill is keen to point out that a number of the intuition pumps Walton utilises are less decisive than has commonly been accepted.
Regarding representational properties, for example, Walton asks us to consider a marble bust of a Roman emperor which seems to us to resemble a man with, say, an aquiline nose, a wrinkled brow, and an expression of grim determination, and about which we take to represent a man with, or as having, those characteristics. The question is why don’t we say that it resembles or represents a motionless man, of uniform (marble) colour, who is severed at the chest? We are interested in representation and it seems the object is in more respects similar to the latter description than the former. Walton is able to account for the fact that we are not struck by the similarity in the latter sense as we are by the former by appeal to his distinction between standard, contra-standard and variable properties:
The bust’s uniform color, motionlessness, and abrupt ending at the chest are standard properties relative to the category of busts, and since we see it as a bust they are standard for us. […] A cubist work might look like a person with a cubical head to someone not familiar with the cubist style. But the standardness of such cubical shapes for people who see it as a cubist work prevents them from making that comparison. (1970, p.345)
His central claim is that what we take a work to represent (or even resemble) depends only on the variable properties, and not those that are standard, for the category under which we perceive it. It seems fairly obvious that this account must be right. Zangwill agrees and is hence led to accept that in the case of representational qualities there is nothing in the objects themselves that could tell the viewer which of the opposing descriptions is appropriate. For this, one must look elsewhere to such things as the history of production or the conventionally accepted practices according to which the object’s intentional content may be derived.
Zangwill argues that while representational properties might not be aesthetic properties (indeed they are possessed by ostensibly non-aesthetic, non-art items such as maps, blueprints, and road signs) they do appear to be among the base (non-aesthetic) properties that determine aesthetic properties. Given that representational properties of a work are, in part, determined by the history of production, and assuming that some aesthetic properties of representational works are partly determined by what they represent, Zangwill concludes some aesthetic properties to be non-formal. This is no problem for the Moderate Formalist of course; Walton’s intuition pump does not lead to an anti-formalist argument for it seems equally clear that only a subclass of artworks are representational works. Many works have no representational properties at all and are thus unaffected by the insistence that representational properties can only be successfully identified via the presence of art-historical or categorical information. Given that Zangwill accepts Walton’s claim in respect only to a subclass of aesthetic objects, Moderate Formalism remains undisturbed.
However, Walton offers other arguments that might be thought to have a more general application and thus forestall this method of “tactical retreat” on the part of the would-be Moderate Formalist. The claim that Walton seems to hold for all artworks (rather than just a subclass) is that the art-historical category into which an artwork falls is aesthetically relevant because one’s belief that a work falls under a particular category affects one’s perception of it—one experiences the work differently when one experiences it under a category. Crucially, understanding a work’s category is a matter of understanding the degrees to which its features are standard, contra-standard and variable with respect to that category. Here is Walton’s most well-known example:
Imagine a society which does not have an established medium of painting, but does produce a kind of work called guernicas. Guernicas are like versions of Picasso’s “Guernica” done in various bas-relief dimensions. All of them are surfaces with the colours and shapes of Picasso’s “Guernica,” but the surfaces are moulded to protrude from the wall like relief maps of different kinds of terrain. […] Picasso’s “Guernica” would be counted as a guernica in this society – a perfectly flat one – rather than as a painting. Its flatness is variable and the figures on its surface are standard relative to the category of guernicas. […] This would make for a profound difference between our reaction to “Guernica” and theirs. (1970, p.347)
When we consider (as a slight amendment to Walton’s example) a guernica in this society that is physically indistinguishable from Picasso’s painting, we should become aware of the different aesthetic responses experienced by members of their society compared to ours. Walton notes that it seems violent, dynamic, vital, disturbing to us, but imagines it would strike them as cold, stark, lifeless, restful, or perhaps bland, dull, boring—but in any case not violent, dynamic, and vital. His point is that the object is only violent and disturbing as a painting, but dull, stark, and so forth as a guernica, hence the thought experiment is supposed to prompt us to agree that aesthetic properties are dependent on (or relative to) the art-historical categories under which the observer subsumes the object in question. Through this example Walton argues that we do not simply judge that an artwork is dynamic and a painting. The only sense in which it is appropriate to claim that Guernica is dynamic is in claiming that it is dynamic as a painting, or for people who see it as a painting.
This analysis has been variously accepted in the literature; it is particularly interesting, therefore, to recognise Zangwill’s initial suspicion of Walton’s account. He notes that a plausible block to this intuition comes in the observation that it becomes very difficult to make aesthetic judgements about whole categories or comparisons of items across categories. Zangwill stipulates that Walton might respond with the claim that we simply widen the categories utilised in our judgements. For example, when we say that Minoan art is (in general) more dynamic than Mycenean art, what we are saying is that this is how it is when we consider both sorts of works as belonging to the class of “prehistoric Greek art”. He continues:
But why should we believe this story? It does not describe a psychological process that we are aware of when we make cross-category judgements. The insistence that we are subconsciously operating with some more embracing category, even though we are not aware of it, seems to be an artefact of the anti-formalist theory that there is no independent reason to believe. If aesthetic judgements are category-dependent, we would expect speakers and thinkers to be aware of it. But phenomenological reflection does not support the category-dependent view. (2001, pp. 92-3)
In these cases, according to Zangwill, support does not appear to be sourced either from phenomenology or from our inferential behaviour. Instead he argues that we can offer an alternative account of what is going on when we say something is “elegant for a C” or “an elegant C”. This involves the claim that questions of goodness and elegance are matters of degree. We often make ascriptions that refer to a comparison class because this is a quicker and easier way of communicating questions of degree. But the formalist will say that the precise degree of some C-thing’s elegance does not involve the elegance of other existing C-things. And being a matter of degree is quite different from being category-dependent. So Zangwill’s claim is that it is pragmatically convenient, but far from essential, that one make reference to a category-class in offering an aesthetic judgement. We are able to make category-neutral aesthetic judgements, and crucially for Zangwill, such judgements are fundamental: category-dependent judgements are only possible because of category-neutral ones. The formalist will hold that without the ability to make category-neutral judgements we would have no basis for comparisons; Walton has not shown that this is not the case.
In this way Zangwill asserts that we can understand that it is appropriate to say that the flat guernica is “lifeless” because it is less lively than most guernicas— but this selection of objects is a particularly lively one. Picasso’s Guernica is appropriately thought of as “vital” because it is more so than most paintings; considered as a class these are not particularly lively. But in fact the painting and the guernica might be equally lively, indeed equivalent in respect of their other aesthetic properties—they only appear to differ in respect of the comparative judgements in which they have been embedded. It is for this reason that Zangwill concludes that we can refuse to have our intuitions “pumped” in the direction Walton intends. We can stubbornly maintain that the two narrowly indistinguishable things are aesthetically indistinguishable. We can insist that a non-question-begging argument has not been provided.
On this view, one can allow that reference to art-historical categories is a convenient way of classifying art, artists, and art movements, but the fact that this convenience has been widely utilised need not be telling against alternative accounts of aesthetic value.
Zangwill’s own distinction between formal and non-formal properties is derived (broadly) from Immanuel Kant’s distinction between free and dependent beauty. Indeed, Zangwill has asserted that “Kant was also a moderate formalist, who opposed extreme formalism when he distinguished free and dependent beauty in §16 of the Critique of Judgement” (2005, p.186). In the section in question Kant writes:
There are two kinds of beauty; free beauty (pulchritudo vaga), or beauty which is merely dependent (pulchritudo adhaerens). The first presupposes no concept of what the object should be; the second does presuppose such a concept and, with it, an answering perfection of the object.
On the side of free beauty Kant lists primarily natural objects such as flowers, some birds, and crustacea, but adds wallpaper patterns and musical fantasias; examples of dependent beauties include the beauty of a building such as a church, palace, or summer-house. Zangwill maintains that dependent beauty holds the key to understanding the non-formal aesthetic properties of art—without this notion it will be impossible to understand the aesthetic importance of pictorial representation, or indeed any of the art-forms he analyses. A work that is intended to be a representation of a certain sort—if that intention is successfully realised—will fulfil the representational function the artist intended, and may (it is claimed) do so beautifully. In other words, some works have non-formal aesthetic properties because of (or in virtue of) the way they embody some historically given non-aesthetic function.
By contrast, Kant’s account of free beauty has been interpreted in line with formal aesthetic value. At §16 and §17, Kant appears to place constraints on the kinds of objects that can exemplify pure (that is, formal) beauty, suggesting that nature, rather than art, provides the proper objects of (pure) aesthetic judgement and that to the extent that artworks can be (pure) objects of tastes they must be abstract, non-representational, works. If this is a consequence of Kant’s account, the strong Formalist position derived from judgements of pure beauty would presumably have to be restricted in application to judgements of abstract art and, perhaps in quotidian cases, the objects of nature. However, several commentators (for example, Crawford (1974) and Guyer (1997)) have maintained that Kant’s distinction between free and dependent beauty does not entail the classification of art (even representational art) as merely dependently beautiful. Crawford, for example, takes the distinction between free and dependent beauty to turn on the power of the judger to abstract towards a disinterested position; this is because he takes Kant’s distinction to be between kinds of judgement and not between kinds of object.
This is not the place for a detailed exegesis of Kant’s aesthetics, but it is pertinent to at least note the suggestion that it is nature (rather than art) that provides the paradigm objects of formal aesthetic judgement. In the next part of this presentation we will explore this possibility, further considering Zangwill’s moderate, and more extreme Formalist conclusions in the domain of nature appreciation.
Allen Carlson is well known for his contribution to the area broadly known as “environmental aesthetics”, perhaps most notably for his discussion of the aesthetic appreciation of nature (2000). Where discussing the value of art Carlson seems to adopt a recognisably moderate formalist position, acknowledging both that where formalists like Bell went wrong was in presupposing formalism to be the only valid way to appreciate visual artworks (pace Part 2), but also suggesting that a “proper perspective” on the application of formalism should have revealed it to be one among many “orientations” deserving recognition in art appreciation (pace Part 3). However, when turning to the appreciation of the natural environment Carlson adopts and defends a strongly anti-formalist position, occupying a stance that has been referred to as “cognitive naturalism”. This part of the presentation briefly discusses Carlson’s rejection of formalism before presenting some moderate, and stronger formalist replies in this domain.
Carlson has characterised contemporary debates in the aesthetics of nature as attempting to distance nature appreciation from theories of the appreciation of art. Contemporary discussion introduces different models for the appreciation of nature in place of the inadequate attempts to apply artistic norms to an environmental domain. For example, in his influential “Appreciation and the Natural Environment” (1979) he had disputed both “object” and “landscape” models of nature appreciation (which might be thought attractive to the Moderate Formalist), favouring the “natural environmental” model (which stands in opposition to the other two). Carlson acknowledged that the “object” model has some utility in the art-world regarding the appreciation of non-representational sculpture (he takes Brancusi’s Bird in Space (1919) as an example). Such sculpture can have significant (formal) aesthetic properties yet no representational connections to the rest of reality or relational connections with its immediate surroundings. Indeed, he acknowledges that the formalist intuitions discussed earlier have remained prevalent in the domain of nature appreciation, meeting significant and sustained opposition only in the domain of art criticism.
When it comes to nature-appreciation, formalism has remained relatively uncontested and popular, emerging as an assumption in many theoretical discussions. However, Carlson’s conclusion on the “object” and “landscape” models is that the former rips natural objects from their larger environments while the latter frames and flattens them into scenery. In focussing mainly on formal properties, both models neglect much of our normal experience and understanding of nature. The “object” model is inappropriate as it cannot recognise the organic unity between natural objects and their environment of creation or display, such environments are—Carlson believes—aesthetically relevant. This model thus imposes limitations on our appreciation of natural objects as a result of the removal of the object from its surroundings (which this model requires in order to address the questions of what and how to appreciate). For Carlson, the natural environment cannot be broken down into discrete parts, divorced from their former environmental relations any more than it can be reduced to a static, two-dimensional scene (as in the “landscape” model). Instead he holds that the natural environment must be appreciated for what it is, both nature and an environment. On this view natural objects possess an organic unity with their environment of creation: they are a part of and have developed out of the elements of their environments by means of the forces at work within those environments. Thus some understanding of the environments of creation is relevant to the aesthetic appreciation of natural objects.
The assumption implicit in the above rejection of Formalism is familiar from the objections (specifically regarding Walton) from Part 3. It is the suggestion that the appropriate way to appreciate some target object is via recourse to the kind of thing it is; taking the target for something it is not does not constitute appropriate aesthetic appreciation of that thing. Nature is natural so cannot be treated as “readymade” art. Carlson holds that the target for the appreciation of nature is also an environment, entailing that the appropriate mode of appreciation is active, involved appreciation. It is the appreciation of a judge who is in the environment, being part of and reacting to it, rather than merely being an external onlooker upon a two-dimensional scene. It is this view that leads to his strong anti-formalist suggestion that the natural environment as such does not possess formal qualities. For example, responding to the “landscape” model Carlson suggests that the natural environment itself only appears to have formal qualities when a person somehow imposes a frame upon it and thus formally composes the resultant view. In such a case it is the framed view that has the qualities, but these will vary depending upon the frame and the viewer’s position. As a consequence Carlson takes the formal features of nature, such as they are, to be (nearly) infinitely realisable; insofar as the natural environment has formal qualities, they have an indeterminateness, making them both difficult to appreciate, and of little significance in the appreciation of nature.
Put simply, the natural environment is not an object, nor is it a static two-dimensional “picture”, thus it cannot be appreciated in ways satisfactory for objects or pictures; furthermore, the rival models discussed do not reveal significant or sufficiently determinate appreciative features. In rejecting these views Carlson has been concerned with the questions of what and how we should appreciate; his answer involves the necessary acknowledgement that we are appreciating x qua x, where some further conditions will be specifiable in relation to the nature of the x in question. It is in relation to this point that Carlson’s anti-formalist “cognitive naturalism” presents itself.
In this respect his stance on nature appreciation differs from Walton’s, who did not extend his philosophical claims to aesthetic judgements about nature (Walton lists clouds, mountains, sunsets), believing that these judgements, unlike judgements of art, are best understood in terms of a category-relative interpretation. By contrast, Carlson can be understood as attempting to extend Walton’s category dependent account of art-appreciation to the appreciation of nature. On this view we do not need to treat nature as we treat those artworks about whose origins we know nothing because it is not the case that we know nothing of nature:
In general we do not produce, but rather discover, natural objects and aspects of nature. Why should we therefore not discover the correct categories for their perception? We discover whales and later discover that, in spite of somewhat misleading perceptual properties, they are in fact mammals and not fish. (Carlson, 2000, p.64)
By discovering the correct categories to which objects or environments belong, we can know which is the correct judgement to make (the whale is not a lumbering and inelegant fish). It is in virtue of this that Carlson claims our judgements of the aesthetic appreciation of nature sustain responsible criticism in the way Walton characterises the appreciation of art. It is for this reason that Carlson concludes that for the aesthetic appreciation of nature, something like the knowledge and experience of the naturalist or ecologist is essential. This knowledge gives us the appropriate foci of aesthetic significance and the appropriate boundaries of the setting so that our experience becomes one of aesthetic appreciation. He concludes that the absence of such knowledge, or any failure to perceive nature under the correct categories, leads to aesthetic omission and, indeed, deception.
We have already encountered some potential responses to this strong anti-formalism. The moderate formalist may attempt to deploy a version of the aesthetic/non-aesthetic distinction such as to deny that the naturalist and ecologist are any better equipped than the rest of us to aesthetically appreciate nature. They are, of course, better equipped to understand nature, and to evaluate (in what we might call a “non-aesthetic” sense) the objects and environments therein. This type of response claims that the ecologist can judge (say) the perfectly self-contained and undisturbed ecosystem, can indeed respond favourably to her knowledge of the rarity of such a find. Such things are valuable in that they are of natural-historical interest. Such things are of interest and significance to natural-historians, no doubt. The naturalist will know that the whale is not “lumbering” compared to most fish (and will not draw this comparison), and will see it as “whale-like”, “graceful”, perhaps particularly “sprightly” compared to most whales. One need not deny that such comparative, cognitive judgements can feel a particular way, or that such judgements are a significant part of the appreciation of nature; but it may be possible to deny that these (or only these) judgements deserve to be called aesthetic.
However, Carlson’s objection is not to the existence of formal value, but to the appropriateness of consideration of such value. Our knowledge of an environment is supposed to allow us to select certain foci of aesthetic significance and abstract from, or exclude, others such as to characterise different kinds of appropriate experience:
…we must survey a prairie environment, looking at the subtle contours of the land, feeling the wind blowing across the open space, and smelling the mix of prairie grasses and flowers. But such an act of aspection has little place in a dense forest environment. Here we must examine and scrutinise, inspecting the detail of the forest floor, listening carefully for the sounds of birds and smelling carefully for the scent of spruce and pine. (Carlson, 2000, p.64)
Clearly knowledge of the terrain and environment that is targeted in each of these cases might lead the subject to be particularly attentive to signs of certain expected elements; however, there are two concerns that are worth highlighting in closing.
Firstly, it is unclear why one should, for all one’s knowledge of the expected richness or desolation of some particular landscape, be in a position to assume of (say) the prairie environment that no detailed local scrutiny should yield the kind of interest or appreciation (both formal and non-formal) that might be found in other environments. It is unclear whether Carlson could allow that such acts might yield appreciation but must maintain that they would not yield instances of aesthetic appreciation of that environment, or whether he is denying the availability of such unpredicted values—in either case the point seems questionable. Perhaps the suspicion is one that comes from proportioning one’s expectation to one’s analysis of the proposed target. The first concern is thus that knowledge (even accurate knowledge) can be as potentially blinding as it is potentially enlightening.
The second concern is related to the first, but poses more of a direct problem for Carlson. His objection to the “object” and “landscape” models regards their propensity to limit the potentiality for aesthetic judgement by taking the target to be something other than it truly is. Part of the problem described above relates to worries regarding the reduction of environments to general categories like prairie landscape, dense forest, pastoral environment such that one enlists expectations of those attentions that will and will not be rewarded, and limits one’s interaction accordingly. While it might be true that some understanding of the kind of environment we are approaching will suggest certain values to expect as well as indicating the act of aspection appropriate for delivering just these, the worry is that this account may be unduly limiting because levels of appreciation are unlikely to exceed the estimations of the theory and the acts of engagement and interaction these provoke. In nature more than anywhere else this seems to fail to do justice to those intuitions that the target really is (amongst other things) a rich, unconstrained sensory manifold. To briefly illustrate the point with a final example, Zangwill (2001, pp.116-8) considers such cases (which he doesn’t think Carlson can account for) as the unexpected or incongruous beauty of the polar bear swimming underwater. Not only is this “the last thing we expected”, but our surprise shows that
…it is not a beauty that we took to be dependent in some way upon our grasp of its polar-bearness. We didn’t find it elegant as a polar bear. It is a category-free beauty. The underwater polar bear is a beautiful thing in beautiful motion…
The suggestion here is that to “do justice to” and thus fully appreciate the target one must be receptive not simply to the fact that it is nature, or that it is an environment, but that it is, first and foremost, the individual environment that it (and not our understanding of it) reveals itself to be. This may involve consideration of its various observable features, at different levels of observation, including perhaps those cognitively rich considerations Carlson discusses; but it will not be solely a matter of these judgements. According to the (Moderate) Formalist, the “true reality” of things is more than Carlson’s account seems capable of capturing, for while a natural environment is not in fact a static two-dimensional scene, it may well in fact possess (amongst other things) a particular appearance for us, and that appearance may be aesthetically valuable. The Moderate Formalist can accommodate that value without thereby omitting acknowledgement of other kinds of values, including those Carlson defends.
Finally, it should be noted that when it comes to inorganic nature, Zangwill has argued for a stronger formalist position (much closer to Bell’s view about visual art). The basic argument for this conclusion is that even if a case can be made for claiming that much of organic nature should be understood and appreciated via reference to some kind of “history of production” (typically in terms of biological functions, usually thought to depend on evolutionary history), inorganic or non-biological nature (rivers, rocks, sunsets, the rings of Saturn) does not have functions and therefore cannot have aesthetic properties that depend on functions. Nor should we aesthetically appreciate inorganic things in the light of functions they do not have.
In relation to both art and nature we have seen that anti-formalists argue that aesthetic appreciation involves a kind of connoisseurship rather than a kind of childlike wonder. Bell’s extreme (artistic) formalism appeared to recommend a rather restricted conception of the art-connoisseur. Walton’s and Carlson’s anti-formalism (in relation to art and nature respectively) both called for the expertise and knowledge base required to identify and apply the “correct” category under which an item of appreciation must be subsumed. Yet the plausibility of challenges to these stances (both the strong formalism of Bell and the strong anti-formalism of Walton and Carlson) appears to be grounded in more moderate, tolerant proposals. Zangwill, for example, defends his moderate formalism as “a plea for open-mindedness” under the auspices of attempts to recover some of our aesthetic innocence.
This presentation began with an historical overview intended to help situate (though not necessarily motivate or defend) the intuition that there is some important sense in which aesthetic qualities pertain to the appearance of things. Anti-formalists point out that beauty, ugliness, and other aesthetic qualities often (or always) pertain to appearances as informed by our beliefs and understanding about the reality of things. Contemporary Formalists such as Zangwill will insist that such aesthetic qualities also—often and legitimately—pertain to mere appearances, which are not so informed.
On this more moderate approach, the aesthetic responses of the connoisseur, the art-historian, the ecologist can be acknowledged while nonetheless insisting that the sophisticated aesthetic sensibility has humble roots and we should not forget them. Formal aesthetic appreciation may be more “raw, naïve, and uncultivated” (Zangwill, 2005, p.186), but arguably it has its place.
The Open University
Last updated: August 12, 2013 | Originally published: