Aesthetics is the subject matter concerning, as a paradigm, fine art, but also the special, art-like status sometimes given to applied arts like architecture or industrial design or to objects in nature. It is hard to say precisely what is shared among this motley crew of objects (often referred to as aesthetic objects), but the aesthetic attitude is supposed to go some way toward solving this problem. It is, at the very least, the special point of view we take toward an object that results in our having an aesthetic experience (an experience of, for example, beauty, sublimity, or even ugliness). Many aesthetic theories, however, have taken it to play a central role in defining the boundary between aesthetic and non-aesthetic objects. These theories, usually called aesthetic attitude theories, argue that when we take the aesthetic attitude toward an object, we thereby make it an aesthetic object.
These theories originate in the notion of disinterest that was investigated by eighteenth-century aesthetic thinkers. While important to these thinkers, the idea of disinterest becomes even more crucial in the aesthetic theories of Kant and Schopenhauer. In these two philosophers, especially the latter, we begin to find aesthetic attitude theories. In the twentieth century, some major thinkers adopted the aesthetic attitude as a fundamental notion, but did not do so without facing serious criticism. Indeed, aesthetic attitude theories are not as popular as they once were, due to this criticism and to a more general shift of focus.
There are two parts to the aesthetic attitude: the aesthetic part, and the attitude part. Here, an attitude is a certain state of mind. In particular, it is a way of approaching experiences or orienting oneself toward the world. It may help to think of someone with an optimistic attitude. He has a tendency to see things in a positive light. With the aesthetic attitude, the thought is not that there are certain people who generally see things, so to speak, in an aesthetic light, but more aligned with what is meant by the request that someone “have a more optimistic attitude” or “take a more positive attitude” about a given circumstance. We are asked, in such situations, to make ourselves attend in a certain way. In adopting an optimistic attitude, we focus on features of the situation that we can spin positively – we may realize the bad things are not really so bad and look instead for a silver lining. In adopting the aesthetic attitude, we focus on features of the situation that we think are relevant aesthetically – we may stop thinking about where we are parked and instead begin following the plot and the character development of the play being performed before us.
As these examples suggest, the aesthetic attitude is supposed to be a frame of mind that we can adopt more or less when we choose to. Of course, difficulties can arise for lots of reasons. A cell phone that rings during a symphony is reviled because it inevitably grabs our attention, and problems may arise adopting the aesthetic attitude, too, if we are distracted by hunger or unable to resist work-related worries. Thus, the analogy to optimism may be apt in a further way. It seems much easier for some people to adopt an optimistic attitude than it is for others, and many philosophers have thought that some people have a knack for taking the aesthetic attitude where others find it harder.
There are paradigm cases where we adopt the aesthetic attitude, for example, in a museum or as a spectator at the theater. It is, however, important to realize that the aesthetic attitude is not simply an attitude we take in museums, but one that we can take toward nature, too. Finding the colors of a sunset or the complexity of a nautilus beautiful means directing an aesthetic attitude toward the sunset or the nautilus and thinking about it aesthetically. Indeed, many have argued that we can take the aesthetic attitude toward anything at all, and in doing so, make it an aesthetic object. A street scene, though we would not describe it as art or nature, could thus be approached aesthetically. Since there are things that we can take the aesthetic attitude toward that are not art, the aesthetic attitude is not just an artistic attitude. It is much broader than that.
Not only can we take the aesthetic attitude toward things that are not art, but we can also take it toward things that are not beautiful. Some art is ugly, and certain artworks even flaunt their ugliness for artistic effect. In fact, calling something ugly is giving it an aesthetic evaluation, which in turn requires taking the aesthetic attitude toward it. So, in adopting the aesthetic attitude, say, toward a sunset, you start to look at the aesthetic features of the sunset. For example, you might pay attention to the visual composition of the landscape and view, or perhaps to the soft color gradations. Upon inspecting these elements, you might actually come to find them unsatisfactory. You might notice a traffic jam, a patch of large, barren trees, or a few unappealing vapor trails left by planes. You might reasonably conclude that it was, upon further inspection, kind of an ugly sunset. This conclusion could only be reached by looking at the scene aesthetically, that is, adopting the aesthetic attitude toward the scene. This makes it clear that we adopt the aesthetic attitude not only toward beautiful things, but also toward ugly things. Indeed, we must adopt the aesthetic attitude if any conclusion about a thing’s beauty or ugliness, in other words its aesthetic standing, is to be reached.
While these remarks make it clear that taking the aesthetic attitude toward something is not the same as finding it beautiful, it is a matter of debate whether the aesthetic attitude involves some kind of pleasure. We have seen that it does not necessarily involve straightforward aesthetic enjoyment or positive aesthetic evaluation, but it might still involve some broader kind of enjoyment, pleasure, or satisfaction. Whether it does and what kind exactly is something to be spelled out by the particular aesthetic attitude theory.
As mentioned above, many reserve the term ‘aesthetic attitude theory’ for a theory according to which aesthetic objects are properly distinguished from non-aesthetic objects by our ability to take the aesthetic attitude toward them. Not everyone agrees on this classification of aesthetic attitude theories, but there is sufficient consensus for us to assume it here. Given that, it may be helpful at the outset to point out that aesthetic attitude theories have experienced waning popularity in the past few decades. This may be due to criticism of the theory or to other theories that offer alternative accounts of the relevant distinction, both of which will be canvassed below.
Before continuing, a word of caution may be helpful. The term ‘aesthetic’ is applied to many things: we have already seen aesthetic attitude, aesthetic objects, and aesthetic experience, but philosophers also talk about aesthetic evaluations and aesthetic judgments (for example, judging that something is beautiful), aesthetic features (for example, symmetry), aesthetic contemplation, aesthetic emotions, and so on. Many of these will come up here, but the important thing to keep in mind is that this is just how philosophers refer to the special class of experiences, judgments, emotions, and so forth. that pertains to the art-like realm discussed above. Different theorists take different views of how these notions relate to each other and which is the most basic, but all take as an aim the discussion of the special sphere of the aesthetic.
There are two ways of thinking about the aesthetic attitude that have been most prevalent. First, it has been thought of as a special kind of disinterested attitude. The person who adopts the aesthetic attitude does not view (hear, taste, and so forth) objects with some kind of personal interest, that is, with a view to what that object can do for her, broadly speaking. A collector may view an expensive painting she owns and praise herself for owning such a rare and pricey piece. We might say that, in such a case, she takes an economic attitude toward the painting, but she without a doubt fails to think about it aesthetically. If she were instead viewing the painting contemplatively, thinking about its composition, meaning, and so on, then she would be thinking about it aesthetically, and that seems to be due to her disinterested attitude toward it. Similarly, a music student taking a music theory test might listen for certain particular keys or chord progressions, but he seems to listen to the music with the goal of getting a good grade on his test, rather than listen to the music simply to enjoy it, or for the experience of listening to it.
For many, disinterest is only a necessary condition of the aesthetic attitude, so that an attitude’s being disinterested does not guarantee that it is an aesthetic attitude. Something else may have to be present. A court judge will approach a trial with disinterest in this sense. He will try to be impartial and not let any personal feelings or goals cloud his judgment, but he does not thereby approach the trial aesthetically. Something else about his attitude would have to be present.
Furthermore, having this kind of disinterested attitude toward something by no means precludes finding it interesting. If the collector, in her more contemplative state, finds the interactions among a certain cluster of figures especially meaningful, then we can describe her as interested in those figures. This does not mean, however, that she is interested in them for some external purpose. Disinterestedness, then, does not indicate complete lack of interest (finding something uninteresting), but a lack of personal investment or goal-directed interest.
Suppose now that the music student above were instead listening to the music simply to enjoy it or just for the experience of listening to it. We might say that he was listening to the music for its own sake. This suggests the second traditional way of characterizing the aesthetic attitude. According to this way of thinking about it, the aesthetic attitude involves considering or appreciating something (for example an artwork) for its own sake. This means that we want to experience the work, not because it fulfills some desire for something else, but just because we want to have that experience. So a museum-goer may spend time in the Egyptian art galleries in order to make her son happy, but she may spend time in Islamic art galleries simply because she wants to look at and experience Islamic art, that is, she wants to see the objects for their own sake and not for the sake of anything beyond or outside of them. We will return to both of these traditional characterizations at greater length below.
Now that some idea of the nature of the aesthetic attitude is in place, we can turn to the development of the aesthetic attitude in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. After that, we will be appropriately placed to look at the three main twentieth-century aesthetic attitude theories and some of the criticisms that have been made of them.
Aesthetic attitude theories are marked by their general insistence on the fundamental importance of the aesthetic attitude. Some of these theories hold that the nature of art is explained by the aesthetic attitude. This is generally accepted as an insufficient way of setting the boundaries of art, for reasons we have already seen, since nature, too, is a perfectly fine thing to take the aesthetic attitude toward. Most aesthetic attitude theories thus offer subtler and more complex accounts of the interaction among the aesthetic attitude, art, and beauty. Indeed, many of these philosophers have been keen on distinguishing a variety of different aesthetic qualities. In addition to beauty, they are interested in sublimity, novelty, charm, and so on.
There is no consensus regarding where exactly in the history of philosophy the aesthetic attitude first appears. The phrase ‘aesthetic attitude’ only appears in print very late in the nineteenth century, so some maintain that, before the twentieth century, there were no aesthetic attitude theories properly speaking. Even granting this, there is still clear historical precedent for the theory, and in spirit these historical theories bear a great deal of resemblance to the later aesthetic attitude theories.
Tracing the aesthetic attitude theory back to its origins, we may find its clearest early ancestor in the eighteenth-century notion of disinterest. This is to be found among a group of British thinkers writing about beauty and taste. Among these, Lord Shaftesbury is probably the earliest to discuss the notion in any real depth. The next important figure is Immanuel Kant, who wrote his three critiques at the end of the eighteenth century, the third of which, the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), is devoted to his theory of aesthetics and teleology. The final seminal figure is Arthur Schopenhauer, whose book The World as Will and Representation (1844) discusses aesthetic contemplation at length. It is in Schopenhauer that some notion of the aesthetic attitude is most noticeable and the similarities to modern theories most apparent. This section will provide an overview of the classical sources of aesthetic attitude theories, starting from their seeds in eighteenth-century British theories of taste, through Kant, and up to Schopenhauer.
The relationship between the aesthetic attitude and eighteenth-century British theories of taste is a subject of debate. Some philosophers, like Jerome Stolnitz, argue that there is a deep continuity, and that, really, these British philosophers have the same essential views as other classical aesthetic attitude theorists like Kant and Schopenhauer. Others, like George Dickie, have argued that there is an important divide between the two groups of theories. The details of the debate aside, it is hard to deny any connection. At the very least, these British philosophers influenced Kant and thus, either directly or indirectly, inspired everyone who has written about the aesthetic attitude since.
Several important British philosophers wrote about aesthetics and art. Shaftesbury, Francis Hutcheson, and David Hume, among yet others, wrote prominently about beauty and taste. Their theories are often referred to as theories of taste because they each essentially involve the notion of a special kind of faculty, the faculty of taste, that we use to determine an object’s aesthetic value. This faculty is generally taken to be naturally better in some than in others, though we can do things to improve it (expose ourselves to variety, learn about the artistic medium, and so on). Later British theorists, such as Edmund Burke, argued against such a faculty, worrying that it failed to really explain anything.
Most importantly, it is in these theories that we first find the notion of disinterest (though in Hume it appears as a lack of “prejudice”). Each of these philosophers argued that aesthetic appreciation involves disinterested pleasure. Despite slight differences among their notions of disinterest, the general idea is clear. When we are disinterested, we do not regard the aesthetic object as a tool for serving our own interests. One might wonder, however, whether it is independent from all other interests and all other values.
Shaftesbury argues that aesthetic experience is disinterested, but has a Platonic picture on which beauty is essentially the same as goodness and truth. Aesthetic appreciation is thus not devoid of any connection whatsoever to other values (ethical and epistemological), despite lacking connection to our personal ends and interests. For him, appreciating something aesthetically involves the same essential feeling as appreciating something morally. Shaftesbury does not, however, have a proper aesthetic attitude theory according to the above classification. His view is not one according to which our approaching something aesthetically makes it an aesthetic object. Beauty, along with morality and truth, are independent of our minds, though it is through taking the aesthetic attitude that we are able to recognize them. Shaftesbury may think that these things depend on the mind of God, but they certainly do not depend on us.
Hutcheson and Hume, on the other hand, disagree with Shaftesbury’s unified view. Both reject the equivalence of beauty, goodness, and truth, and see more of a gap between aesthetic value and other values. The details of Hutcheson and Hume differ, but both adopt Shaftesbury’s stress on disinterest. This is the crucial point on which all three theorists agree: they all share the central idea of disinterested pleasure as independent from personal interest, and it is this notion that forms the starting point for aesthetic attitude theories.
Kant is the next place to look for a theory of the aesthetic attitude. He takes up the notion of our judgments of beauty, but seems to follow earlier suspicions about a special faculty of taste. He opts instead to make his central notion that of aesthetic judgments, also called judgments of taste or judgments of the beautiful. His task is then to explain what exactly these are and how we make them. According to Kant, aesthetic judgments involve four important aspects. They must be disinterested, be universal, exhibit purposiveness without purpose, and be necessary. This article will focus mainly on disinterestedness, as it is there that we see most clearly the connection to the aesthetic attitude. A brief explanation of the other three will be included, as well, in order to present a clearer picture of the overall view. (See also the article on Kant’s Aesthetics.)
The first necessary condition regards the quality that our judgments of taste have. This is not quality in the sense of their being good or bad, accurate or inaccurate, or so on. Instead, by the quality of such judgments, Kant means their nature, what they are like and what they feel like. Kant points out, first, that all judgments of taste are essentially subjective. They come from our feelings, not from any objective fact that exists out in the world. He then argues that there are three kinds of satisfaction: that which we take in the agreeable, the beautiful, and the good, and he uses the contrasts to better clarify the nature of judgments of taste.
First, the agreeable gratifies some desire. We find tea agreeable when we have a desire for tea. In this sense, the pleasure in the tea is interested, since it serves our purpose. Kant also points out that our finding it agreeable depends essentially on us and our psychology. This also means, though, that it is not up to us to choose what to find agreeable. Our psychologies determine what we find agreeable, and we cannot change what we desire simply by willing to. One cannot stop a craving, for example, just by choosing to stop, since cravings do not work that way.
Next, we come to the good. The good is esteemed and approved, and there is objective value set on it. We find being generous good when we set objective value on generosity or generous actions. Pleasure in the good is also interested, since, for Kant, reason determines what we find good. This is still a personal interest because each person has an interest in bringing about the good. The person who finds generosity good has an interest in bringing about a more generous world, for example, by being generous and encouraging other people to do so.
The beautiful, in contrast, is disinterested pleasure. The art collector who enjoys her artwork for its monetary value enjoys that work in an interested way, and thus has not taken the aesthetic attitude toward it. Consequently, any positive judgment she produces will not be a judgment of taste. Kant takes this idea further, arguing that anyone who really approaches something with a contemplative, disinterested attitude and finds it beautiful (that is, takes the aesthetic attitude toward it) will not even be interested in whether the object in fact exists. To want the object to exist is to have an interest wrapped up in it, or in other words, to have something be at stake in its existence. Kant illustrates his point with a helpful example. Imagine a conversation in which one person asks another whether he finds a certain palace beautiful. He answers by saying that he dislikes things made on the backs and at the expense of the proletariat, or that he would never want such a thing for himself. These are cases where the palace’s existence is offensive or undesirable. The man has simply not answered the question of its beauty. The man has not taken an aesthetic attitude toward it. This is what Kant means when he says that the object’s existence cannot factor into the judgment. The aesthetic attitude is related to these remarks in that we must have a certain frame of mind, that is, a disinterested one, in order to make aesthetic judgments.
There are three other conditions of judgments of taste. They must be universal, which just means that they feel as though they apply to everyone. Calling something beautiful means feeling like everyone should recognize it as beautiful (even if we realize that it is not a fact about the object that it is beautiful). The objects of these judgments also exhibit what Kant calls purposiveness without purpose, or alternatively, finality without an end (a translation offered by Creed Meredith). This may sound complex, but it just means that, while there may be no actual purpose of the object (or at least, not one of which we are aware), we are struck by how it seems to be made for a purpose. For example, though we may not know why a plant’s leaves are arranged in angles echoing the Fibonacci sequence, we notice a certain pattern and appreciate the purposiveness there. If, though, the actual purpose entered our judgment, then we would have the beginnings of interested pleasure, which Kant has argued cannot be aesthetic. Finally, these judgments are also necessary in the sense that it feels like we judge according to some unspoken universal rule, from which our judgment necessarily follows.
Above, we saw that Kant takes aesthetic judgments to be subjective. However, the bigger picture reveals a more nuanced view. Such judgments come from our feelings of pleasure, but only when we take that pleasure to be universal, necessary, and felt in response to purposiveness rather than purpose. The universality, necessity, and reaction to the appearance of purpose (and not to actual purpose) exist only because our pleasure is disinterested. It is precisely when we experience this kind of subjective yet disinterested pleasure that we think these judgments hold universally and necessarily. Thus disinterest, a notion first brought to the fore by the eighteenth-century British philosophers, continues to be a central notion in Kant’s aesthetics. However, Kant does not seem to have a true aesthetic attitude theory in the sense defined above. It is a matter of interpretation, but it looks as though he does not think that any object we approach with this frame of mind thereby becomes an aesthetic object. Many argue that it is not until Schopenhauer, for whom disinterest is even more important, that we see an actual aesthetic attitude theory.
The notion of the aesthetic attitude may not appear fully formed until Schopenhauer, in Book III of The World as Will and Representation. Schopenhauer does not use the term ‘aesthetic attitude’, either, but instead talks about aesthetic contemplation. His understanding of this form of contemplation, however, is clearly related to twentieth-century aesthetic attitude theories, and as such he is generally looked to as the historical philosopher whose view is closest to the contemporary versions of the theory
To understand his view of the aesthetic attitude, it helps to know a little bit about Schopenhauer’s philosophy. He understands life as driven by the Will, which is a kind of unceasing desire and forms the basis of perpetual human suffering. When we desire something, we suffer in not having it. If we were to obtain all the things we desired, we would be overcome with boredom, a deeper and more poignant suffering. Experiencing the world in this way is experiencing the world as Will. However, he sees a few ways out of this. The most permanent solution is to adopt a severe ascetic outlook and stop having desires at all, but a temporary solution is to be found in aesthetic contemplation, where we experience the world as representation rather than as Will.
In a famous passage (section 34), Schopenhauer describes a few things that go along with the aesthetic attitude (although, again, he does not use this term). We may then begin to see how this contemplative state can release us from the cycle of suffering. First, we do not look at things in the ordinary way. This is generally accepted as having both a perceptual meaning and a non-perceptual one. There is a special aesthetic mode of perception where we attend much more fully to the surface features of an object. However, we also typically look at something with an eye to its relationships to other things. Schopenhauer argues that this boils down to looking at it with an eye to how it might help our own goals, that is, relate to our wills. In the aesthetic attitude, though, this relational viewing is completely absent, and we only pay attention to things themselves. Second, we do not have in mind abstract thought or reasoning, but instead focus on the perception alone. Here Schopenhauer says that the representation fills our mind and we are thus filled with calm contemplation. In this way, we stop thinking about the will and, since the perception takes up all of our mental ‘space’, we no longer sense a difference between ourselves and the object perceived. This means that, third, we will begin to see, in a sense, through the object itself to its Idea. So far, what this means is a bit opaque, but we can understand it in the following way. When we stop looking at the particular thing and what it might do for our own ends, we stop experiencing the world as related to our wills. Instead, we experience the world as representation. But these representations must be of something, and indeed they are representations of Ideas. These are similar to Plato’s Ideas or Forms: they are eternal and unchangeable. So when we contemplate things aesthetically, that is, take the aesthetic attitude toward things, we can know the Ideas. (It is, moreover, the aim of the aesthetic attitude to know the Ideas.)
Since everything represents Ideas and manifests the will in some way, anything can become the object of the aesthetic attitude. Not only does this mean that, according to our definition, Schopenhauer has an aesthetic attitude theory, but it also means that the aesthetic attitude has profound practical import. It can release us from the cycle of constant suffering, since we stop experiencing our wills in any way. Aesthetic contemplation also helps us deal with very real, very difficult situations. If we start to think aesthetically about the world, other people, and ourselves, then we will stop being angry, resentful, or sad (though we will also stop being excited or happy). We will instead see things that cause us pain as manifestations of the Idea of humanity, as nothing new or special. To put it a slightly different way, we will stop taking things personally. The vicissitudes of life will become just that, simply fluctuations through which we can have real encounters with Ideas.
It would be misleading to suggest that taking the aesthetic attitude is easy and comes naturally to everyone. It is even slightly misleading to call it aesthetic contemplation. Contemplation suggests passivity, but Schopenhauer argues that artistic geniuses can not only actively adopt the aesthetic attitude, but can also remain in that state for longer than the typical fleeting moment. They find beauty in all kinds of places and use art to communicate their insights to the rest of us. These views have inspired a debate about whether the aesthetic attitude (and aesthetic experience) is active or passive: whether we can make ourselves adopt this outlook and have aesthetic experiences, or whether they simply happen to us when the stars align just right. Schopenhauer answers that the aesthetic attitude is some mix of these, that certain people are more adept at engaging it actively, while it is a transient and happenstance state for others.
In Schopenhauer, we thus see a clear extension of the earlier notion of disinterest. In aesthetic contemplation, we stop thinking about the world and the objects in it as means to our ends, that is, as objects of our will. We also see attention and perception take center stage. Aesthetic contemplation, which can be active or passive, involves intense focus where the perception completely fills the mind. Finally, we see a crucial role for the aesthetic attitude in the larger theory. It helps us know Ideas, and by doing so, releases us from endless suffering. Many aspects of Schopenhauer’s view have resonated with subsequent philosophers of aesthetics. But in order to fully adopt his view, one must adopt much of the rest of his philosophy, that is, his theory of Ideas, representation, and the Will. Later aesthetic attitude theorists are generally unwilling to do this, but they still manage to preserve some key aspects of the view.
There are three prominent aesthetic attitude theorists in the twentieth century: Edward Bullough, Jerome Stolnitz, and Roger Scruton. Each of these three theorists tries to accomplish at least two major goals. First, each tries to give an intuitive definition of what the aesthetic attitude is, one that does not make the wrong attitudes (for example, interested ones) aesthetic attitudes but includes all the attitudes that do seem to be aesthetic. The second aim of each theory is to say something about the relationship between the aesthetic attitude and the philosophy of art and aesthetics more generally. In particular, they all use the aesthetic attitude to provide a definition of aesthetic objects, that is, to demarcate aesthetic objects from non-aesthetic ones.
Bullough, a psychologist, is the first theorist here to use the term ‘aesthetic attitude’, but actually most often uses the interchangeable term ‘aesthetic consciousness’. His theory essentially involves disinterest, which he talks about as psychical distance. It is worth noting at the outset that his theory has not gained widespread support, though it has significantly contributed to the shaping of subsequent theories of the aesthetic attitude. We will see that his way of approaching and developing the notion of disinterest, though perhaps flawed, provides an interesting and evocative metaphor for aesthetic experience.
Bullough calls the central feature of aesthetic consciousness psychical distance, a metaphorical extension of spatial and temporal distance. We are all familiar with what it is to be distanced from something in space; it is just to be far away. Similarly, to be temporally distant from something is to exist, say, a hundred years after it. Bullough characterizes the experience of psychical distance as that of not being very emotionally close to or attached to something and not thinking about its practical role. His example is of a fog. Normally, a fog at sea causes us anxiety because it drastically reduces our field of vision, is associated with unexpected dangers, and is difficult to navigate. If, however, we take the aesthetic attitude toward it, we can direct our attention to its surface features. The fog may look soft and even palpable, and the air may feel peaceful and still. These latter sensations occur because we have been able to insert the proper psychical distance between ourselves and the fog.
This distance, Bullough says, is the result of putting the perceived object “out of gear” with our practical interests. Our practical ends should have no traction on our thoughts when we are properly distanced. We should not think about practical or personal concerns, but instead focus on the object itself. We also need, therefore, to be properly distanced from certain emotions, like those that concern our personal stake or even those that concern morality. That said, emotional response is still intimately involved in aesthetic consciousness and experience, but these emotions need to be generalized beyond our individual, particular feelings. So far, this sounds similar to the notion of disinterest discussed above. Bullough adds to this by explaining two ways distancing can go wrong.
We can fail to be properly distanced from a work if we are too psychically close to it or too psychically far away – that is, if we are too emotionally involved or too emotionally removed. Bullough refers to these conditions respectively as under-distancing and over-distancing. Under-distancing occurs when we are unable to separate our personal interests from what we experience. Suppose a jealous husband watches a performance of Othello and becomes increasingly suspicious, his rage building, and eventually only really sees himself and his wife instead of Othello and Desdemona. This man is under-distanced, since his emotions are too involved in the play’s action. On the other hand, imagine a brilliant satire of ancient Chinese society that we are now in very poor position to appreciate. This is a case of over-distancing. For many such works, the artwork may be sadly unable to engage our emotions sufficiently because we are too removed from it. Thus there is what Bullough terms a distance-limit, beyond which we are too far away to have aesthetic consciousness. He says that, practically speaking, people should err on the side of trying to distance themselves, since our tendency is to get too emotionally involved. What we should aim for, in theory, is the greatest distance without passing the distance-limit.
Here, we can see that spatial and temporal distance are not merely metaphors for psychical distance. We are too temporally removed to properly engage with the brilliant Chinese satire. Similarly, Bullough argues, being too spatially close to a work can make us unable to engage with it properly. This is in fact how he explains the relegation of culinary art to a second class art form. Since we have to taste these things and thus come into direct physical contact with them, we are simply unable to distance ourselves sufficiently from them.
Bullough also uses his theory to interesting effect in explaining why artists are sometimes censored, ostracized, or banned. Artists are better able to distance themselves than the average person, so they see more objects aesthetically. Non-artists, however, may look at the art and see only a hypersexualized youth (Nabokov’s Lolita), say, or a sacrilegious depiction of a holy figure (Serrano’s “Piss Christ”)
Many have found these implications implausible. Physical closeness to a work, for example, does not actually seem to preclude the proper psychical distance or disinterested attitude. There are further worries that, at best, Bullough only offers a necessary condition for the aesthetic attitude. Without something further, he ca not distinguish it from the court judge’s disinterested attitude. That said, Bullough is still an important figure in the development of aesthetic attitude theory. His development of a structured and explanatorily ambitious view set the tone for the aesthetic attitude theories that follow.
For Stolnitz, the aesthetic attitude involves attending to something (anything) in a disinterested and sympathetic way, and doing so for its own sake. When we look at something in a disinterested way, we look at it non-instrumentally. This is just to say that we do not look at it as a means (as an instrument) to some other end. So, as above, the collector who admires her painting for its rarity fails to engage with her painting aesthetically. Similarly, the music student who looks for musical knowledge in the keys and chords of the symphony does not engage with it aesthetically. Interestingly, Stolnitz mentions that this also implies that the attitude of an art critic, either amateur or professional, is opposed to the aesthetic attitude. To see why this is so, it is enough to recognize that the critic has a goal: to form and pass judgment.
By including sympathy as a criterion of the aesthetic attitude, Stolnitz introduces the idea that the right attitude must take the artwork on its own terms. One needs to ignore personal conflicts and biases. The discovery that an artist was a miser should not change one’s aesthetic attitude toward the work, though it may give one pause when thinking morally about the artist. To up the ante, he argues that in order to view propaganda art or Nazi art with the proper aesthetic viewpoint, one will have to view it sympathetically, as well, and ignore the moral backdrop against which these things exist. (Nobody said that taking the aesthetic attitude was easy.) Failure to do so will taint any aesthetic experience that results, something we may be able to see in our occasional complaints to others that they “haven’t even given it a chance.” (To be clear, Stolnitz does not make and is not committed to any claims about the moral import of taking the aesthetic attitude in these difficult situations.)
Stolnitz understands attention, the third major component of his definition, as a kind of alert state. He agrees with predecessors that it is a kind of contemplation, but says that we have to understand contemplation in the right way. He agrees with Schopenhauer that the aesthetic attitude is not as passive as the term ‘contemplation’ suggests. (He disagrees, however, with Schopenhauer’s claim that only artistic geniuses can actively engage in aesthetic contemplation.) Aesthetic contemplation does not involve simply sitting back, relaxing, and letting the mind wander. It involves mental focus and thought, and such intense mental involvement may manifest itself in a tightening of muscles during a thrilling scene, a foot tapping to the beat, or a tilt of one’s head like the figure in a painting. Such physical manifestations are not required by the aesthetic attitude, but they exemplify the active, engaged mental state that itself does constitute the proper attitude.
Stolnitz is a proper aesthetic attitude theorist who argues that we can adopt the aesthetic attitude toward anything. He acknowledges that this implies that nothing is inherently unaesthetic. Stolnitz offers intuitive support for this view, pointing out that artists often approach ugly or boring objects with the aesthetic attitude and create something beautiful. A deformed and hideous bell pepper may, when approached in the right way, become a striking aesthetic object, as in the photographs of Edward Weston. Similarly, a humble shipping container or typeface may, when one takes the proper aesthetic attitude toward it, appear noble, subtle, and beautiful. So we can find traditionally ugly things aesthetic, but we can also find boring, everyday objects aesthetic when we approach them in the right way. It follows, moreover, from this view that neither art nor nature is inherently more aesthetic than the other. Since nothing is inherently unaesthetic, nothing in art is at an aesthetic disadvantage to anything in nature, and vice versa.
He also uses the aesthetic attitude to demarcate the bounds between things that count as aesthetically relevant and irrelevant, that is, what is and is not relevant to the aesthetic experience and to any verdict that may result from it. Thoughts that are compatible with disinterested, sympathetic attention can be aesthetically relevant as long as they do not divert attention away from the aesthetic object. Certain kinds of interpretation can thus count as aesthetically relevant or be ruled out as irrelevant. A poem might perfectly well suggest a cathedral without saying it explicitly. The thought of a cathedral that accompanies the poem is thus aesthetically relevant. However, it might also remind one of a personal experience, say, of one’s wedding that took place in a cathedral. This diverts attention away from the poem and is thus, argues Stolnitz, aesthetically irrelevant.
Stolnitz also applies these ideas to the problem of determining the aesthetic relevance of external facts. Such facts are aesthetically relevant when they (1) do not weaken our aesthetic attention, (2) pertain to the meaning or expressiveness of the object, and (3) enhance the quality of one’s aesthetic response. For example, it may be relevant to know that a certain painting is of the crucifixion of Jesus. It may, however, be irrelevant that Gauguin’s rendering of the Crucifixion does not accurately capture the story as it is told in the gospels. Perhaps the point is, so to speak, precisely to paint it in a different light.
Of all the theorists surveyed here, Stolnitz falls most squarely into our model of an aesthetic attitude theorist. His notion of the aesthetic attitude is completely explicit and forms the core of his theory. He uses it to define aesthetic objects and explain the aesthetic relevance of external thoughts and facts, as well as a host of related aesthetic issues.
For Scruton, the aesthetic attitude has three main components. First, its goal is some kind of pleasure, enjoyment, or satisfaction. This means that, although the aesthetic attitude may not always in fact yield pleasure, it is our hope in taking such an attitude that it will. If we thought there were no enjoyment of any kind we could get out of an object, we would not attend to it aesthetically. The view should not be mistaken for what we might call aesthetic hedonism, the view that aesthetic value resides solely in a thing’s ability to give us pleasure. Pleasure should not be thought of too narrowly, either. Sad music can afford aesthetic satisfaction, as can paintings of violent scenes.
The aesthetic attitude must also involve attention to an object for its own sake. Scruton expresses dissatisfaction about how little the notion of ‘for its own sake’ has been explained by other theorists. To see this, consider that we know perfectly well what it means to do something for our own sake or for someone else’s sake. It is to do something with their interests in mind. What would attending to art for the sake of the art’s interests be, though? Scruton finds the particular phrase strange, but tries to find the kernel of insight in it. To be interested in something for its own sake involves a desire to go on experiencing it, but not in order to satisfy another, separate desire. This means that, if the art collector has a desire to look at her painting, and part of her desire to look at it is that she desires to admire its rarity, then she has not taken the aesthetic attitude. She is interested in it for its own sake only when there are no other desires she has that seeing the painting would satisfy.
Third and finally, the aesthetic attitude is normative. Normative just means that there is a certain kind of ‘should’-ness about it or that it explicitly or implicitly contains a value judgment. If a mother tells her son to be respectful, she makes a normative claim on him: that it is good to be respectful, and that he should do it. Furthermore, if she just notices that he is being disrespectful and disapproves, there is something normative involved in her disapproving reaction. The aesthetic attitude is normative in the sense that any judgment that comes out of the aesthetic attitude carries normative force. In other words, when we think that something is beautiful, we think that other people should find it beautiful, too. This is how Scruton, a self-proclaimed Kantian, sees himself as taking on Kant’s view above that aesthetic judgments are universal.
It is worth remarking that Scruton may not be talking about the aesthetic attitude as we have seen it so far. Until now, the aesthetic attitude has been understood as a state of mind or a kind of viewpoint that one can generally adopt at will, and that must exist prior to any aesthetic experience. Scruton writes, however, that the aesthetic attitudes are what we express when we make aesthetic judgments. This would mean that, in calling something beautiful, we make an aesthetic judgment and thus express an aesthetic attitude, namely, the aesthetic attitude we had when we judged or experienced the object as beautiful. While not a problem with his view, this means that he may not be talking about exactly the same thing as the earlier theorists. Among other things, this view leads to there being many different aesthetic attitudes, rather than just one special frame of mind or mode of perception that we are in when we have particular aesthetic experiences. Scruton’s definition may actually come closer to the normal meaning of ‘attitude’, in the way that we talk about an attitude of disapproval or an attitude of hope. Here, we find attitudes of beauty, elegance, loveliness, their opposites, and so on.
In 1964, George Dickie offered a set of famous objections to aesthetic attitude theories. After Dickie, the aesthetic attitude has received very little attention outside Scruton, which may suggest a general acceptance of his objections. A few defenses of aesthetic attitude theories have been offered, but the literature has not stirred much since, indicating perhaps instead simply a waning interest in the topic.
In his well-known paper, “The Myth of the Aesthetic Attitude,” Dickie objects in turn to each of Bullough and Stolnitz’s theories. Dickie argues that the former thinks of distancing as a special kind of action that we can perform: we put ourselves “out of gear” with practical concerns. We can aim to and can successfully distance ourselves from perceived objects. These make distancing sound very much like an action. Dickie swiftly dismisses this view on the grounds that there really is no such special action. What really happens in such cases is that we attend differently, and attending is a perfectly normal and unmysterious action. One might worry about the details of Dickie’s argument here, but since Stolnitz’s view is the more nuanced and fully developed of the two, the majority of criticism is focused on his view.
Recall that, for Stolnitz, the aesthetic attitude involves a special kind of aesthetic perception: disinterested, sympathetic attention. Dickie focuses on the ‘disinterested’ part of this definition, noting first that ‘disinterested’ is an unhelpful clarification unless it means something to be ‘interested’. Stolnitz, so far, should be fine with this, and we may recall that he gives many cases of interested attention to clarify what disinterest amounts to.
In essence Dickie argues that there are really no cases of interested attention. Any alleged case of interested attention in fact falls into one of two categories: either it is not attention to the artwork at all; or it is, but it really is not a different kind of attention from disinterested attention. On the one hand, there are examples like the jealous husband watching Othello or the art collector who is happy about her investment. Dickie argues that these are really cases where the perceiver is not actually paying attention to the artwork. In the former case, the jealous husband is paying attention to the situation with his wife rather than the play. In the latter case, the art collector is paying attention to her finances, rather than the painting.
On the other hand, there are cases like the music student paying attention to chord progressions or a father watching his daughter at a piano recital. In these situations, Dickie argues, the music student and the father are paying attention to the artwork. There is no difference in their manner of attending or perceiving, despite perhaps a difference in motive. To sharpen this, the idea is that there is no special mode of perception that corresponds uniquely to the way we perceive when we adopt the aesthetic attitude. There is only one way to perceive or attend to something, and that is just by looking at it or noting features of it. The father, the music student, and the ideal aesthetic perceiver are all doing just that. The father and music student may be differently motivated, but this means nothing for the way in which they actually perceive or attend to the work.
The key to Dickie’s argument is that he takes Bullough and Stolnitz to understand the aesthetic attitude as involving a special kind of action or attention. From this, he argues that there is no special mode or manner of acting or attending that uniquely produces aesthetic experiences.
As mentioned earlier, some responses to this have been offered. Gary Kemp offered an extended response to Dickie’s objections. Foremost among these is the denial of Dickie’s crucial premise that there is only really one way of acting or attending. Kemp argues that there are many different ways of attending. The music student may attend to the chord progressions, to the orchestration, or to the rhythms. Here, the student seems to be attending fully, but also in an interested way. But if he attends for the sake of enjoyment, then he is certainly attending differently and perhaps disinterestedly. These, Kemp says, are genuinely different ways of attending, and the real difficulty of the aesthetic attitude theory is to explain why some of them seem aesthetic and some do not. He then offers his own explanation of this distinction.
Kemp argues that disinterested attention does not seem to select the right cases. For example, it is intuitive that the father who attends his daughter’s recital could attend perfectly aesthetically to her performance, despite the fact that the reason he is there is to see his daughter. Kemp instead prefers Scruton’s notion of interest in the experience for its own sake. This supports examples like the father. Once he starts listening, he has a desire to go on listening to the music, we can imagine, and this desire does not now depend on any other desire to sustain it (although it came to exist only because he wanted to hear his daughter play). There is now no reason for his desire aside from his wanting to keep listening to the music.
Aesthetic attitude theories have enjoyed isolated appearances in the past forty years, but the interest in it may be declining. Again, this may be due in part to the belief that Dickie’s criticisms were devastating and final, but it may also be due to the general dissatisfaction with the theoretical role the aesthetic attitude has been made to play. Many have moved to views of aesthetic experience, rather than aesthetic attitude, as the crucial notion to be considered. The differences between the two are subtle, but definite. Recall that the aesthetic attitude is a point of view one takes. It is, in a sense, a way of priming our experience in which we mentally set ourselves up to pay attention to certain things. The experiences that result, if we have been successful, are aesthetic experiences. These aesthetic experiences, in certain contemporary views, play the theoretical role that the aesthetic attitude was originally meant to play. Thus, philosophers have recently tried to draw the boundary between aesthetic and non-aesthetic objects using the notion of an aesthetic experience instead of the aesthetic attitude. The things that afford aesthetic experiences (or, alternatively, facilitate it) are aesthetic objects. These views can extend their theoretical reaches further in many ways. For example, they can offer a definition of artworks as the things that are created intentionally in order to afford aesthetic experiences. As such, these theories may have largely supplanted the original aesthetic attitude theories, since aesthetic experience can seem like a less presumptuous notion and more theoretically powerful. This move to aesthetic experience is most prominent in the work of Monroe Beardsley, but also to be found in Malcolm Budd, Kendall Walton, and many other contemporary thinkers. Whatever the fate of the aesthetic attitude theories and the aesthetic experience theories that follow them, the notion of a special kind of aesthetic attitude or experience remains, if not of central theoretical importance, of great interest in thinking about our aesthetic lives.
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Last updated: May 14, 2012 | Originally published: