Aesthetics may be defined narrowly as the theory of beauty, or more broadly as that together with the philosophy of art. The traditional interest in beauty itself broadened, in the eighteenth century, to include the sublime, and since 1950 or so the number of pure aesthetic concepts discussed in the literature has expanded even more. Traditionally, the philosophy of art concentrated on its definition, but recently this has not been the focus, with careful analyses of aspects of art largely replacing it. Philosophical aesthetics is here considered to center on these latter-day developments. Thus, after a survey of ideas about beauty and related concepts, questions about the value of aesthetic experience and the variety of aesthetic attitudes will be addressed, before turning to matters which separate art from pure aesthetics, notably the presence of intention. That will lead to a survey of some of the main definitions of art which have been proposed, together with an account of the recent “de-definition” period. The concepts of expression, representation, and the nature of art objects will then be covered.
The full field of what might be called “aesthetics” is a very large one. There is even now a four-volume encyclopedia devoted to the full range of possible topics. The core issues in Philosophical Aesthetics, however, are nowadays fairly settled (see the book edited by Dickie, Sclafani, and Roblin, and the monograph by Sheppard, among many others).
Aesthetics in this central sense has been said to start in the early eighteenth century, with the series of articles on “The Pleasures of the Imagination” which the journalist Joseph Addison wrote in the early issues of the magazine The Spectator in 1712. Before this time, thoughts by notable figures made some forays into this ground, for instance in the formulation of general theories of proportion and harmony, detailed most specifically in architecture and music. But the full development of extended, philosophical reflection on Aesthetics did not begin to emerge until the widening of leisure activities in the eighteenth century.
By far the most thoroughgoing and influential of the early theorists was Immanuel Kant, towards the end of the eighteenth century. Therefore it is important, first of all, to have some sense of how Kant approached the subject. Criticisms of his ideas, and alternatives to them, will be presented later in this entry, but through him we can meet some of the key concepts in the subject by way of introduction.
Kant is sometimes thought of as a formalist in art theory; that is to say, someone who thinks the content of a work of art is not of aesthetic interest. But this is only part of the story. Certainly he was a formalist about the pure enjoyment of nature, but for Kant most of the arts were impure, because they involved a “concept.” Even the enjoyment of parts of nature was impure, namely when a concept was involved— as when we admire the perfection of an animal body or a human torso. But our enjoyment of, for instance, the arbitrary abstract patterns in some foliage, or a color field (as with wild poppies, or a sunset) was, according to Kant, absent of such concepts; in such cases, the cognitive powers were in free play. By design, art may sometimes obtain the appearance of this freedom: it was then “Fine Art”—but for Kant not all art had this quality.
In all, Kant’s theory of pure beauty had four aspects: its freedom from concepts, its objectivity, the disinterest of the spectator, and its obligatoriness. By “concept,” Kant meant “end,” or “purpose,” that is, what the cognitive powers of human understanding and imagination judge applies to an object, such as with “it is a pebble,” to take an instance. But when no definite concept is involved, as with the scattered pebbles on a beach, the cognitive powers are held to be in free play; and it is when this play is harmonious that there is the experience of pure beauty. There is also objectivity and universality in the judgment then, according to Kant, since the cognitive powers are common to all who can judge that the individual objects are pebbles. These powers function alike whether they come to such a definite judgment or are left suspended in free play, as when appreciating the pattern along the shoreline. This was not the basis on which the apprehension of pure beauty was obligatory, however. According to Kant, that derived from the selflessness of such an apprehension, what was called in the eighteenth century its “disinterest.” This arises because pure beauty does not gratify us sensuously; nor does it induce any desire to possess the object. It “pleases,” certainly, but in a distinctive intellectual way. Pure beauty, in other words, simply holds our mind’s attention: we have no further concern than contemplating the object itself. Perceiving the object in such cases is an end in itself; it is not a means to a further end, and is enjoyed for its own sake alone.
It is because Morality requires we rise above ourselves that such an exercise in selfless attention becomes obligatory. Judgments of pure beauty, being selfless, initiate one into the moral point of view. “Beauty is a symbol of Morality,” and “The enjoyment of nature is the mark of a good soul” are key sayings of Kant. The shared enjoyment of a sunset or a beach shows there is harmony between us all, and the world.
Among these ideas, the notion of “disinterest” has had much the widest currency. Indeed, Kant took it from eighteenth century theorists before him, such as the moral philosopher, Lord Shaftesbury, and it has attracted much attention since: recently by the French sociologist Pierre Bourdieu, for instance. Clearly, in this context “disinterested” does not mean “uninterested,” and paradoxically it is closest to what we now call our “interests,” that is, such things as hobbies, travel, and sport, as we shall see below. But in earlier centuries, one’s “interest” was what was to one’s advantage, that is, it was “self-interest,” and so it was the negation of that which closely related aesthetics to ethics.
The eighteenth century was a surprisingly peaceful time, but this turned out to be the lull before the storm, since out of its orderly classicism there developed a wild romanticism in art and literature, and even revolution in politics. The aesthetic concept which came to be more appreciated in this period was associated with this, namely sublimity, which Edmund Burke theorized about in his “A Philosophical Enquiry into the Origin of our ideas of the Sublime and Beautiful.” The sublime was connected more with pain than pure pleasure, according to Burke, since threats to self-preservation were involved, as on the high seas, and lonely moors, with the devilish humans and dramatic passions that artists and writers were about to portray. But in these circumstances, of course, it is still “delightful horror,” as Burke appreciated, since one is insulated by the fictionality of the work in question from any real danger.
“Sublime” and “beautiful” are only two amongst the many terms which may be used to describe our aesthetic experiences. Clearly there are “ridiculous” and “ugly,” for a start, as well. But the more discriminating will have no difficulty also finding something maybe “fine,” or “lovely” rather than “awful” or “hideous,” and “exquisite” or “superb” rather than “gross” or “foul.” Frank Sibley wrote a notable series of articles, starting in 1959, defending a view of aesthetic concepts as a whole. He said that they were not rule- or condition-governed, but required a heightened form of perception, which one might call taste, sensitivity, or judgment. His full analysis, however, contained another aspect, since he was not only concerned with the sorts of concepts mentioned above, but also with a set of others which had a rather different character. For one can describe works of art, often enough, in terms which relate primarily to the emotional and mental life of human beings. One can call them “joyful,” “melancholy,” “serene,” “witty,” “vulgar,” and “humble,” for instance. These are evidently not purely aesthetic terms, because of their further uses, but they are still very relevant to many aesthetic experiences.
Sibley’s claim about these concepts was that there were no sufficient conditions for their application. For many concepts—sometimes called “closed” concepts, as a result—both necessary and sufficient conditions for their application can be given. To be a bachelor, for instance, it is necessary to be male and unmarried, though of marriageable age, and together these three conditions are sufficient. For other concepts, however, the so-called “open” ones, no such definitions can be given— although for aesthetic concepts Sibley pointed out there were still some necessary conditions, since certain facts can rule out the application of, for example, “garish,” “gaudy,” or “flamboyant.”
The question therefore arises: how do we make aesthetic judgments if not by checking sufficient conditions? Sibley’s account was that, when the concepts were not purely perceptual they were mostly metaphoric. Thus, we call artworks “dynamic,” or “sad,” as before, by comparison with the behaviors of humans with those qualities. Other theorists, such as Rudolph Arnheim and Roger Scruton, have held similar views. Scruton, in fact, discriminated eight types of aesthetic concept, and we shall look at some of the others below.
We have noted Kant’s views about the objectivity and universality of judgments of pure beauty, and there are several ways that these notions have been further defended. There is a famous curve, for instance, obtained by the nineteenth century psychologist Wilhelm Wundt, which shows how human arousal is quite generally related to complexity of stimulus. We are bored by the simple, become sated, even over-anxious, by the increasingly complex, while in between there is a region of greatest pleasure. The dimension of complexity is only one objective measure of worth which has been proposed in this way. Thus it is now known, for instance, that judgments of facial beauty in humans are a matter of averageness and symmetry. Traditionally, unity was taken to be central, notably by Aristotle in connection with Drama, and when added to complexity it formed a general account of aesthetic value. Thus Francis Hutcheson, in the eighteenth century, asserted that “Uniformity in variety always makes an object beautiful.” Monroe Beardsley, more recently, has introduced a third criterion—intensity—to produce his three “General Canons” of objective worth. He also detailed some “Special Canons.”
Beardsley called the objective criteria within styles of Art “Special Canons.” These were not a matter of something being good of its kind and so involving perfection of a concept in the sense of Kant. They involved defeasible “good-making” and “bad-making” features, more in the manner Hume explained in his major essay in this area, “Of the Standard of Taste” (1757). To say a work of art had a positive quality like humor, for instance, was to praise it to some degree, but this could be offset by other qualities which made the work not good as a whole. Beardsley defended all of his canons in a much more detailed way than his eighteenth century predecessor however: through a lengthy, fine-grained, historical analysis of what critics have actually appealed to in the evaluation of artworks. Also, he explicitly made the disclaimer that his canons were the only criteria of value, by separating these “objective reasons” from what he called “affective” and “genetic” reasons. These two other sorts of reasons were to do with audience response, and the originating artist and his times, respectively, and either “The Affective Fallacy” or “The Intentional Fallacy,” he maintained, was involved if these were considered. The discrimination enabled Beardsley to focus on the artwork and its representational relations, if any, to objects in the public world.
Against Beardsley, over many years, Joseph Margolis maintained a “Robust Relativism.” Thus he wanted to say that “aptness,” “partiality,” and “non-cognitivism” characterize art appreciation, rather than “truth,” “universality,” and “knowledge.” He defended this with respect to aesthetic concepts, critical judgments of value, and literary interpretations in particular, saying, more generally, that works of art were “culturally emergent entities” not directly accessible, because of this, to any faculty resembling sense perception. The main debate over aesthetic value, indeed, concerns social and political matters, and the seemingly inevitable partiality of different points of view. The central question concerns whether there is a privileged class, namely those with aesthetic interests, or whether their set of interests has no distinguished place, since, from a sociological perspective, that taste is just one amongst all other tastes in the democratic economy. The sociologist Arnold Hauser preferred a non-relativistic point of view, and was prepared to give a ranking of tastes. High art beat popular art, Hauser said, because of two things: the significance of its content, and the more creative nature of its forms. Roger Taylor, by contrast, set out very fully the “leveller’s” point of view, declaring that “Aida” and “The Sound of Music” have equal value for their respective audiences. He defended this with a thorough philosophical analysis, rejecting the idea that there is such a thing as truth corresponding to an external reality, with the people capable of accessing that truth having some special value. Instead, according to Taylor, there are just different conceptual schemes, in which truth is measured merely by coherence internal to the scheme itself. Janet Wolff looked at this debate more disinterestedly, in particular studying the details of the opposition between Kant and Bourdieu.
Jerome Stolnitz, in the middle of the last century, was a Kantian, and promoted the need for a disinterested, objective attitude to art objects. It is debatable, as we saw before, whether this represents Kant’s total view of art, but the disinterested treatment of art objects which Stolnitz recommended was very commonly pursued in his period.
Edward Bullough, writing in 1912, would have called “disinterested attention” a “distanced” attitude, but he used this latter term to generate a much fuller and more detailed appreciation of the whole spectrum of attitudes which might be taken to artworks. The spectrum stretched from people who “over-distance” to people who “under-distance.” People who over-distance are, for instance, critics who merely look at the technicalities and craftwork of a production, missing any emotional involvement with what it is about. Bullough contrasted this attitude with what he called “under-distancing,” where one might get too gripped by the content. The country yokel who jumps upon the stage to save the heroine, and the jealous husband who sees himself as Othello smothering his wife, are missing the fact that the play is an illusion, a fiction, just make-believe. Bullough thought there was, instead, an ideal mid-point between his two extremes, thereby solving his “antinomy of distance” by deciding there should be the least possible distance without its disappearance.
George Dickie later argued against both “disinterest” and “distance” in a famous 1964 paper, “The Myth of the Aesthetic Attitude.” He argued that we should be able to enjoy all objects of awareness, whether “pure aesthetic” or moral. In fact, he thought the term “aesthetic” could be used in all cases, rejecting the idea that there was some authorized way of using the word just to apply to surface or formal features— the artwork as a thing in itself. As a result, Dickie concluded that the aesthetic attitude, when properly understood, reduced to just close attention to whatever holds one’s mind in an artwork, against the tradition which believed it had a certain psychological quality, or else involved attention just to certain objects.
Art is not the only object to draw interest of this pleasurable kind: hobbies and travel are further examples, and sport yet another, as was mentioned briefly above. In particular, the broadening of the aesthetic tradition in recent years has led theorists to give more attention to sport. David Best, for instance, writing on sport and its likeness to art, highlighted how close sport is to the purely aesthetic. But he wanted to limit sport to this, and insisted it had no relevance to ethics. Best saw art forms as distinguished expressly by their having the capacity to comment on life situations, and hence bring in moral considerations. No sport had this further capacity, he thought, although the enjoyment of many sports may undoubtedly be aesthetic. But many art forms—perhaps more clearly called “craft-forms” as a result— also do not comment on life situations overmuch, for example, décor, abstract painting, and non-narrative ballet. And there are many sports which are pre-eminently seen in moral, “character-building” terms, for example, mountaineering, and the various combat sports (like boxing and wrestling). Perhaps the resolution comes through noting the division Best himself provides within sport-forms, between, on the one hand, “task” or “non-purposive” sports like gymnastics, diving, and synchronized swimming, which are the ones he claims are aesthetic, and on the other hand the “achievement,” or “purposive’ sports, like those combat sports above. Task sports have less “art” in them, since they are not as creative as the purposive ones.
The traditional form of art criticism was biographical and sociological, taking into account the conceptions of the artist and the history of the traditions within which the artist worked. But in the twentieth century a different, more scientific and ahistorical form of literary criticism grew up in the United States and Britain: The New Criticism. Like the Russian Formalists and French Structuralists in the same period, the New Critics regarded what could be gleaned from the work of art alone as relevant to its assessment, but their specific position received a much-discussed philosophical defense by William Wimsatt and Monroe Beardsley in 1946. Beardsley saw the position as an extension of “The Aesthetic Point of View”; Wimsatt was a practical critic personally engaged in the new line of approach. In their essay “The Intentional Fallacy,” Wimsatt and Beardsley claimed “the design or intention of the artist is neither available nor desirable as a standard for judging the success of a work of literary art.” It was not always available, since it was often difficult to obtain, but, in any case, it was not appropriately available, according to them, unless there was evidence for it internal to the finished work of art. Wimsatt and Beardsley allowed such forms of evidence for a writer’s intentions, but would allow nothing external to the given text.
This debate over intention in the literary arts has raged with full force into more recent times. A contemporary of Wimsatt and Beardsley, E.D. Hirsch, has continued to maintain his “intentionalist” point of view. Against him, Steven Knapp and Walter Benn Michaels have taken up an ahistorical position. Frank Cioffi, one of the original writers who wrote a forceful reply to Wimsatt and Beardsley, aligned himself with neither camp, believing different cases were “best read” sometimes just as, sometimes other than as, the artist knowingly intended them. One reason he rejected intention, at times, was because he believed the artist might be unconscious of the full significance of the artwork.
A similar debate arises in other art forms besides Literature, for instance Architecture, Theater, and Music, although it has caused less professional comment in these arts, occurring more at the practical level in terms of argument between “purists” and “modernizers.” Purists want to maintain a historical orientation to these art forms, while modernizers want to make things more available for contemporary use. The debate also has a more practical aspect in connection with the visual arts. For it arises in the question of what devalues fakes and forgeries, and by contrast puts a special value on originality. There have been several notable frauds perpetrated by forgers of artworks and their associates. The question is: if the surface appearance is much the same, what especial value is there in the first object? Nelson Goodman was inclined to think that one can always locate a sufficient difference by looking closely at the visual appearance. But even if one cannot, there remain the different histories of the original and the copy, and also the different intentions behind them.
The relevance of such intentions in visual art has entered very prominently into philosophical discussion. Arthur Danto, in his 1964 discussion of “The Artworld,” was concerned with the question of how the atmosphere of theory can alter how we see artworks. This situation has arisen in fact with respect to two notable paintings which look the same, as Timothy Binkley has explained, namely Leonardo’s original “Mona Lisa” and Duchamp’s joke about it, called “L.H.O.O.Q. Shaved.” The two works look ostensibly the same, but Duchamp, one needs to know, had also produced a third work, “L.H.O.O.Q.,” which was a reproduction of the “Mona Lisa,” with some graffiti on it: a goatee and moustache. He was alluding in that work to the possibility that the sitter for the “Mona Lisa” might have been a young male, given the stories about Leonardo’s homosexuality. With the graffiti removed the otherwise visually similar works are still different, since Duchamp’s title, and the history of its production, alters what we think about his piece.
Up to the “de-definition” period, definitions of art fell broadly into three types, relating to representation, expression, and form. The dominance of representation as a central concept in art lasted from before Plato’s time to around the end of the eighteenth century. Of course, representational art is still to be found to this day, but it is no longer pre-eminent in the way it once was. Plato first formulated the idea by saying that art is mimesis, and, for instance, Bateaux in the eighteenth century followed him, when saying: “Poetry exists only by imitation. It is the same thing with painting, dance and music; nothing is real in their works, everything is imagined, painted, copied, artificial. It is what makes their essential character as opposed to nature.”
In the same century and the following one, with the advent of Romanticism, the concept of expression became more prominent. Even around Plato’s time, his pupil Aristotle preferred an expression theory: art as catharsis of the emotions. And Burke, Hutcheson, and Hume also promoted the idea that what was crucial in art were audience responses: pleasure in Art was a matter of taste and sentiment. But the full flowering of the theory of Expression, in the twentieth century, has shown that this is only one side of the picture.
In the taxonomy of art terms Scruton provided, Response theories concentrate on affective qualities such as “moving,” “exciting,” “nauseous,” “tedious,” and so forth. But theories of art may be called “expression theories” even though they focus on the embodied, emotional, and mental qualities discussed before, like “joyful,” “melancholy,” “humble,” “vulgar,” and “intelligent.” As we shall see below, when recent studies of expression are covered in more detail, it has been writers like John Hospers and O.K. Bouwsma who have preferred such theories. But there are other types of theory which might, even more appropriately, be called “expression theories.” What an artist is personally expressing is the focus of self-expression theories of art, but more universal themes are often expressed by individuals, and art-historical theories see the artist as merely the channel for broader social concerns.
R. G. Collingwood in the 1930s took art to be a matter of self-expression: “By creating for ourselves an imaginary experience or activity, we express our emotions; and this is what we call art.” And the noteworthy feature of Marx’s theory of art, in the nineteenth century, and those of the many different Marxists who followed him into the twentieth century, was that they were expression theories in the “art-Historical” sense. The arts were taken, by people of this persuasion, to be part of the superstructure of society, whose forms were determined by the economic base, and so art came to be seen as expressing, or “reflecting” those material conditions. Social theories of art, however, need not be based on materialism. One of the major social theorists of the late nineteenth century was the novelist Leo Tolstoy, who had a more spiritual point of view. He said: “Art is a human activity consisting in this, that one man consciously, by means of certain external signs, hands on to others feelings he has lived through, and that others are infected by these feelings and also experience them.”
Coming into the twentieth century, the main focus shifted towards abstraction and the appreciation of form. The aesthetic, and the arts and crafts movements, in the latter part of the nineteenth century drew people towards the appropriate qualities. The central concepts in aesthetics are here the pure aesthetic ones mentioned before, like “graceful,” “elegant,” “exquisite,” “glorious,” and “nice.” But formalist qualities, such as organization, unity, and harmony, as well as variety and complexity, are closely related, as are technical judgments like “well-made,” “skilful,” and “professionally written.” The latter might be separated out as the focus of Craft theories of art, as in the idea of art as “Techne” in ancient Greece, but Formalist theories commonly focus on all of these qualities, and “aesthetes” generally find them all of central concern. Eduard Hanslick was a major late nineteenth century musical formalist; the Russian Formalists in the early years of the revolution, and the French Structuralists later, promoted the same interest in Literature. Clive Bell and Roger Fry, members of the influential Bloomsbury Group in the first decades of the twentieth century, were the most noted early promoters of this aspect of Visual art.
Bell’s famous “Aesthetic Hypothesis” was: “What quality is shared by all objects that provoke our aesthetic emotions? Only one answer seems possible— significant form. In each, lines and colors combined in a particular way; certain forms and relations of forms, stir our aesthetic emotions. These relations and combinations of lines and colors, these aesthetically moving forms, I call ‘Significant Form’; and ‘Significant Form’ is the one quality common to all works of visual art.” Clement Greenberg, in the years of the Abstract Expressionists, from the 1940s to the 1970s, also defended a version of this Formalism.
Abstraction was a major drive in early twentieth century art, but the later decades largely abandoned the idea of any tight definition of art. The “de-definition” of art was formulated in academic philosophy by Morris Weitz, who derived his views from some work of Wittgenstein on the notion of games. Wittgenstein claimed that there is nothing which all games have in common, and so the historical development of them has come about through an analogical process of generation, from paradigmatic examples merely by way of “family resemblances.”
There are, however, ways of providing a kind of definition of art which respects its open texture. The Institutional definition of art, formulated by George Dickie, is in this class: “a work of art is an artefact which has had conferred upon it the status of candidate for appreciation by the artworld.” This leaves the content of art open, since it is left up to museum directors, festival organizers, and so forth, to decide what is presented. Also, as we saw before, Dickie left the notion of “appreciation” open, since he allowed that all aspects of a work of art could be attended to aesthetically. But the notion of “artefact,” too, in this definition is not as restricted as it might seem, since anything brought into an art space as a candidate for appreciation becomes thereby “artefactualized,” according to Dickie— and so he allowed as art what are otherwise called (natural) “Found Objects,” and (previously manufactured) “Readymades.” Less emphasis on power brokers was found in Monroe Beardsley’s slightly earlier aesthetic definition of art: “an artwork is something produced with the intention of giving it the capacity to satisfy the aesthetic interest”— where “production” and “aesthetic” have their normal, restricted content. But this suggests that these two contemporary definitions, like the others, merely reflect the historical way that art developed in the associated period. Certainly traditional objective aesthetic standards, in the earlier twentieth century, have largely given way to free choices in all manner of things by the mandarins of the public art world more recently.
Response theories of art were particularly popular during the Logical Positivist period in philosophy, that is, around the 1920s and 1930s. Science was then contrasted sharply with Poetry, for instance, the former being supposedly concerned with our rational mind, the latter with our irrational emotions. Thus the noted English critic I. A. Richards tested responses to poems scientifically in an attempt to judge their value, and unsurprisingly found no uniformity. Out of this kind of study comes the common idea that “art is all subjective”: if one concentrates on whether people do or do not like a particular work of art then, naturally, there can easily seem to be no reason to it.
We are now more used to thinking that the emotions are rational, partly because we now distinguish the cause of an emotion from its target. If one looks at what emotions are caused by an artwork, not all of these need target the artwork itself, but instead what is merely associated with it. So what the subjective approach centrally overlooks are questions to do with attention, relevance, and understanding. With those as controlling features we get a basis for normalizing the expected audience’s emotions in connection with the artwork, and so move away from purely personal judgments such as “Well, it saddened me” to more universal assessments like “it was sad.”
And with the “it” more focused on the artwork we also start to see the significance of the objective emotional features it metaphorically possesses, which were what Embodiment theorists like Hospers settled on as central. Hospers, following Bouwsma, claimed that the sadness of some music, for instance, concerns not what is evoked in us, nor any feeling experienced by the composer, but simply its physiognomic similarity to humans when sad: “it will be slow not tripping; it will be low not tinkling. People who are sad move more slowly, and when they speak they speak softly and low.” This was also a point of view developed at length by the gestalt psychologist Rudolph Arnheim.
The discriminations do not stop there, however. Guy Sircello, against Hospers, pointed out first that there are two ways emotions may be embodied in artworks: because of their form (which is what Hospers chiefly had in mind), and because of their content. Thus, a picture may be sad not because of its mood or color, but because its subject matter or topic is pathetic or miserable. That point was only a prelude, however, to an even more radical criticism of Embodiment theories by Sircello. For emotion words can also be applied, he said, on account of the “artistic acts” performed by the artists in presenting their attitude to their subject. If we look upon an artwork from this perspective, we are seeing it as a “symptom” in Suzanne Langer’s terms; however, Langer believed one should see it as a “symbol” holding some meaning which can be communicated to others.
Communication theorists all combine the three elements above, namely the audience, the artwork, and the artist, but they come in a variety of stamps. Thus, while Clive Bell and Roger Fry were Formalists, they were also Communication Theorists. They supposed that an artwork transmitted “aesthetic emotion” from the artist to the audience on account of its “significant form.” Leo Tolstoi was also a communication theorist but of almost the opposite sort. What had to be transmitted, for Tolstoi, was expressly what was excluded by Bell and (to a lesser extent) Fry, namely the “emotions of life.” Tolstoi wanted art to serve a moral purpose: helping to bind communities together in their fellowship and common humanity under God. Bell and Fry saw no such social purpose in art, and related to this difference were their opposing views regarding the value of aesthetic properties and pleasure. These were anathema to Tolstoi, who, like Plato, thought they led to waste; but the “exalted” feelings coming from the appreciation of pure form were celebrated by Bell and Fry, since their “metaphysical hypothesis” claimed it put one in touch with “ultimate reality.” Bell said, “What is that which is left when we have stripped a thing of all sensations, of all its significance as a means? What but that which philosophers used to call ‘the thing in itself’ and now call ‘ultimate reality’.”
This debate between moralists and aesthetes continues to this day with, for instance, Noël Carroll supporting a “Moderate Moralism” while Anderson and Dean support “Moderate Autonomism.” Autonomism wants aesthetic value to be isolated from ethical value, whereas Moralism sees them as more intimately related.
Communication theorists generally compare art to a form of Language. Langer was less interested than the above theorists in legislating what may be communicated, and was instead concerned to discriminate different art languages, and the differences between art languages generally and verbal languages. She said, in brief, that art conveyed emotions of various kinds, while verbal language conveyed thoughts, which was a point made by Tolstoy too. But Langer spelled out the matter in far finer detail. Thus, she held that art languages were “presentational” forms of expression, while verbal languages were “discursive”— with Poetry, an art form using verbal language, combining both aspects, of course. Somewhat like Hospers and Bouwsma, Langer said that art forms presented feelings because they were “morphologically similar” to them: an artwork, she held, shared the same form as the feeling it symbolizes. This gave rise to the main differences between presentational and discursive modes of communication: verbal languages had a vocabulary, a syntax, determinate meanings, and the possibility of translation, but none of these were guaranteed for art languages, according to Langer. Art languages revealed “what it is like” to experience something— they created “virtual experiences.”
The detailed ways in which this arises with different art forms Langer explained in her 1953 book Feeling and Form. Scruton followed Langer in several ways, notably by remarking that the experience of each art form is sui generis, that is, “each of its own kind.” He also spelled out the characteristics of a symbol in even more detail. Discussions of questions specific to each art form have been pursued by many other writers; see, for instance, Dickie, Sclafani, and Roblin, and the recent book by Gordon Graham.
Like the concept of Expression, the concept of Representation has been very thoroughly examined since the professionalization of Philosophy in the twentieth century.
Isn’t representation just a matter of copying? If representation could be understood simply in terms of copying, that would require “the innocent eye,” that is, one which did not incorporate any interpretation. E. H. Gombrich was the first to point out that modes of representation are, by contrast, conventional, and therefore have a cultural, socio-historical base. Thus perspective, which one might view as merely mechanical, is only a recent way of representing space, and many photographs distort what we take to be reality— for instance, those from the ground of tall buildings, which seem to make them incline inwards at the top.
Goodman, too, recognized that depiction was conventional; he likened it to denotation, that is, the relation between a word and what it stands for. He also gave a more conclusive argument against copying being the basis of representation. For that would make resemblance a type of representation, whereas if a resembles b, then b resembles a— yet a dog does not represent its picture. In other words, Goodman is saying that resemblance implies a symmetric relationship, but representation does not. As a result, Goodman made the point that representation is not a craft but an art: we create pictures of things, achieving a view of those things by representing them as this or as that. As a result, while one sees the objects depicted, the artist’s thoughts about those objects may also be discerned, as with Sircello’s “artistic arts.” The plain idea that just objects are represented in a picture was behind Richard Wollheim’s account of representational art in the first edition of his book Art and Its Objects (1968). There, the paint in a picture was said to be “seen as” an object. But in the book’s second edition, Wollheim augmented this account to allow for what is also “seen in” the work, which includes such things as the thoughts of the artist.
There are philosophical questions of another kind, however, with respect to the representation of objects, because of the problematic nature of fictions. There are three broad categories of object which might be represented: individuals which exist, like Napoleon; types of thing which exist, like kangaroos; and things which do not exist, like Mr. Pickwick, and unicorns. Goodman’s account of representation easily allowed for the first two categories, since, if depictions are like names, the first two categories of painting compare, respectively, with the relations between the proper name “Napoleon” and the person Napoleon, and the common name “kangaroo” and the various kangaroos. Some philosophers would think that the third category was as easily accommodated, but Goodman, being an Empiricist (and so concerned with the extensional world), was only prepared to countenance existent objects. So for him pictures of fictions did not denote or represent anything; instead, they were just patterns of various sorts. Pictures of unicorns were just shapes, for Goodman, which meant that he saw the description “picture of a unicorn” as unarticulated into parts. What he preferred to call a “unicorn-picture” was merely a design with certain named shapes within it. One needs to allow there are “intensional” objects as well as extensional ones before one can construe “picture of a unicorn’ as parallel to “picture of a kangaroo.” By contrast with Goodman, Scruton is one philosopher more happy with this kind of construal. It is a construal generally more congenial to Idealists, and to Realists of various persuasions, than to Empiricists.
The contrast between Empiricists and other types of philosopher also bears on other central matters to do with fictions. Is a fictional story a lie about this world, or a truth about some other? Only if one believes there are other worlds, in some kind of way, will one be able to see much beyond untruths in stories. A Realist will settle for there being “fictional characters,” often enough, about which we know there are some determinate truths— wasn’t Mr. Pickwick fat? But one difficulty then is knowing things about Mr. Pickwick other than what Dickens tells us— was Mr. Pickwick fond of grapes, for instance? An Idealist will be more prepared to consider fictions as just creatures of our imaginations. This style of analysis has been particularly prominent recently, with Scruton essaying a general theory of the imagination in which statements like “Mr. Pickwick was fat” are entertained in an “unasserted” fashion. One problem with this style of analysis is explaining how we can have emotional relations with, and responses to, fictional entities. We noticed this kind of problem before, in Burke’s description “delightful horror”: how can audiences get pleasure from tragedies and horror stories when, if those same events were encountered in real life, they would surely be anything but pleasurable? On the other hand, unless we believe that fictions are real, how can we, for instance, be moved by the fate of Anna Karenina? Colin Radford, in 1975, wrote a celebrated paper on this matter which concluded that the “paradox of emotional response to fiction” was unsolvable: adult emotional responses to fictions were “brute facts,” but they were still incoherent and irrational, he said. Radford defended this conclusion in a series of further papers in what became an extensive debate. Kendall Walton, in his 1990 book Mimesis and Make-Believe, pursued at length an Idealist’s answer to Radford. At a play, for instance, Walton said the audience enters into a form of pretence with the actors, not believing, but making believe that the portrayed events and emotions are real.
What kind of thing is a work of art? Goodman, Wollheim, Wolterstorff, and Margolis have been notable contributors to the contemporary debate.
We must first distinguish the artwork from its notation or “recipe,” and from its various physical realizations. Examples would be: some music, its score, and its performances; a drama, its script, and its performances; an etching, its plate, and its prints; and a photograph, its negative, and its positives. The notations here are “digital” in the first two cases, and “analogue” in the second two, since they involve discrete elements like notes and words in the one case, and continuous elements like lines and color patches in the other. Realizations can also be divided into two broad types, as these same examples illustrate: there are those that arise in time (performance works) and those that arise in space (object works). Realizations are always physical entities. Sometimes there is only one realization, as with architect-designed houses, couturier-designed dresses, and many paintings, and Wollheim concluded that in these cases the artwork is entirely physical, consisting of that one, unique realization. However, a number a copies were commonly made of paintings in the middle ages, and it is theoretically possible to replicate even expensive clothing and houses.
Philosophical questions in this area arise mainly with respect to the ontological status of the idea which gets executed. Wollheim brought in Charles Peirce’s distinction between types and tokens, as an answer to this: the number of different tokens of letters (7), and different types of letter (5), in the string “ABACDEC,” indicates the difference. Realizations are tokens, but ideas are types, that is, categories of objects. There is a normative connection between them as Margolis and Nicholas Wolterstorff have explained, since the execution of ideas is an essentially social enterprise.
That also explains how the need for a notation arises: one which would link not only the idea with its execution, but also the various functionaries. Broadly, there are the creative persons who generate the ideas, which are transmitted by means of a recipe to manufacturers who generate the material objects and performances. “Types are created, particulars are made” it has been said, but the link is through the recipe. Schematically, two main figures are associated with the production of many artworks: the architect and the builder, the couturier and the dressmaker, the composer and the performer, the choreographer and the dancer, the script-writer and the actor, and so forth. But a much fuller list of operatives is usually involved, as is very evident with the production of films, and other similar large entertainments. Sometimes the director of a film is concerned to control all its aspects, when we get the notion of an “auteur” who can be said to be the author of the work, but normally, creativity and craft thread through the whole production process, since even those designated “originators” still work within certain traditions, and no recipe can limit entirely the end product.
The associated philosophical question concerns the nature of any creativity. There is not much mystery about the making of particulars from some recipe, but much more needs to be said about the process of originating some new idea. For creation is not just a matter of getting into an excited mental state— as in a “brainstorming” session, for instance. That is a central part of the “creative process theory,” a form of which is to be found in the work of Collingwood. It was in these terms that Collingwood distinguished the artist from the craftsperson, namely with reference to what the artist was capable of generating just in his or her mind. But the major difficulty with this kind of theory is that any novelty has to be judged externally in terms of the artist’s social place amongst other workers in the field, as Jack Glickman has shown. Certainly, if it is to be an original idea, the artist cannot know beforehand what the outcome of the creative process will be. But others might have had the same idea before, and if the outcome was known already, then the idea thought up was not original in the appropriate sense. Thus the artist will not be credited with ownership in such cases. Creation is not a process, but a public achievement: it is a matter of breaking the tape ahead of others in a certain race.
Barry Hartley Slater
University of Western Australia
Last updated: July 25, 2005 | Originally published: