The African Predicament
The African predicament is a concept that explains the aggregate of plights that threaten the African people. It is also an account that combines methods from various disciplines since the robustness of the theme is not limited to the field of philosophy alone but serves as a problem for consideration in the social sciences, sciences, and the humanities; thus it interrogates the predicaments of the African from all these perspectives. This task of interrogation becomes more demanding because of the critical analytic outlook of philosophy in embracing various methods that are relevant in the African predicament. Although it places the African as being on the defensive side of reality having been bedeviled with numerous plagues, it does not exempt the African race in the execution of the problematic situations in which they find themselves. While constantly searching for scapegoats to apportion blame in order to gain psychological relief, Africans are also a threat to themselves; hence a people who have been trained to laugh at themselves bears the greater burden of ensuring liberation, not from the clutches of an alien, but from the enemy that lies within. Clarke (1991, 24) puts it succinctly when he said that a people who have been dehumanized have among them a separate group who are at odds within themselves. It is worth noting that this article aims to present what is basic and common knowledge insofar as the theme of African predicament is concern rather than an attempt to demonize any particular race/people.
Table of Contents
- Various Dimensions of the African Predicament
- References and Further Readings
The concept of the African predicament is a holistic one that can be viewed through various lenses depending on the approach(es) that scholars decide to begin their debate. So no single scholar exhausts in totality this captivating yet problematic theme, but even from their relative perspectives, there is a meeting point on the consensus of that which depicts the African predicament. Stanislav Andreski succinctly captures the purpose of the theme that largely lies in exploring those obstacles that bedevil the African continent and thus hinder it on the road to wholesome prosperity, internal peace, and basic/fundamental freedom (Andreski, 1968, 11). Obi Oguejiofor attests to the relativity of such claims but goes further to opine that in the midst of divergent opinions of the African plague, there is a general consensus that much of Africa is in a precarious state, and this concern runs very deep in the mind of an African (Oguejiofor, 2001, 7). Although the predicament of the African people ranges from cultural, political, economic religious, historical, and psychological factors, there is a single thread that binds all of these together in the collective psyche of the African. Until the African is able to mentally decolonize himself or herself, there would be a constant race-to-the-bottom-approach away from all other factors that make the liberation and prosperity of the African race possible. The African predicament becomes a relevant theme in African philosophy because while the sociologist, psychologist, historian, artist, scientist, and so on create ideological superstructure in their various disciplines, philosophy, which thrives mainly on objectivity, harmonizes experiences and views from all fields of study in a critically acclaimed manner without bias/preference to any; therefore, philosophy is that necessary stem that should hold all other branches in an objectified manner. In not laying claim to any discipline, philosophy lays claim to all disciplines.
When we make reference to the African predicament, “African” in this context is not limited to a black individual on the African soil. This is because over the years, the dispersal of the African people has been made possible by the event of colonialism and imperialism. Even before the advent of colonialism, Africans were evidently residing in parts of the Western hemisphere antedating the Columbus-discovery conspiracy theory (Imhotep, 2012, 17). Both in Africa and every other continent where the black individual is located, the plights are similar. Wilson attests to the fact that the black race is wholly bonded not necessarily because they came from the womb of same woman but because the shared experience coupled with the long history of collective parentage brings them together (Wilson, 2014, 50).
One of the greatest challenges Africans have is the location of affirmation of their true identity. They carry such burden into economics, culture, religion, and every facet of their being. Thus, having been washed white as snow from their sins by a white Jesus, because sin which is immaterial has been bestowed with a Lockean secondary quality of darkness/blackness, they also wait for a white-washing of their economy, education, culture, religion, and so on. Hence, the richness of their identity as Africans is not dependent on what they make of it but is dependent on what the American or European says it is. The immateriality of salvation by a white savior and the materiality of socio-political, economic, and cultural redemption from the racialisation of colour bear some semblance (Wilson 2014, 38). And since even the location of heaven and hell is determined by the white individual, they are left with the consolation of both heaven and hell as alternative possibilities so as to distract them from their obligations in the material world, all to the advantage of the colonizers who are then left to extract from the natural universe. Since they have no unique identity of their own, they become whoever anybody says they are. At that point when they forget their location in time and space for the benefit of heaven alone, social amnesia sets in (Wilson, 2014, 41, 58).
It comes to the fore that the African predicament began with a racial distinction of colours; however, it is now evident that this predicament has transcended from raciality into the mind. Hence, it is evidently possible to see black individuals in white souls carrying a burden of identity everywhere they go; this burden of identity further complicates the problem because while the average African sees himself or herself as black, he or she fails to also see beyond this Lockean secondary quality of colours. One of the plights that bedevil the African continent is the inability to rally round a race-centred consciousness that sees the black individual first before any other: “No race of people has triumphed without these vital motivational, mental and behavioral orientations, for they are the keystones in the construction of liberated and prosperous peoples” (Wilson, 2014, 375).
The African predicament is explicated within five major themes. The first theme, which is the notion of economic enslavement and the crisis of leadership, x-rays how the problem of lack of leadership on the part of Africans has been exploited to imperialize the African continent and control its resources. The second theme is the mis-education of Africans and the falsification of history and how it has further led to collective historical dementia. Because the education that is received is largely a transmission from the occidental world, the third theme explicates how philosophy and western historiography interrogate this quest to further expunge the African continent from the development of the history of philosophy. The fourth theme is the culture and identity crisis where there is a gradual effort to show how the craving for an identity, other than African, depletes the collective humanity of the African people. Finally, the fifth theme exposes how religion is used to enslave, rather than liberate, the black individual. The onus rests on no one else but the African people to disturb the equilibrium in order to regain independence in all spheres of their being.
Long before Oguejiofor wrote his Philosophy and the African Predicament, Andreski had written a piece centred on the theme, The African Predicament. However, it is worth noting that in no page of his work did Oguejiofor make reference to the work of Andreski, yet in all their submissions, the problems noted by Andreski in the ’60s are still the same problems, bearing the same form with different matter (matter and form are used here in the philosophical sense). Similarly in writing his book, The Destruction of Black Civilization, Chancellor Williams made reference to the fact that the subtitle of the book, Great Issues of a Race from 4500 B.C. to 2000 A.D., represents a present continuous usage since “the main obstacles which confronted us in the past and are with us today will still be with us in the year 2000 and after, but also that for the rest of this century it is very likely that the Blacks will still be meeting, listening to and applauding fiery, soul-stirring speeches, protesting and denouncing injustices or happily relying on politics as the ultimate solution of our problems” (Williams, 1987, 320). Moreover, Wilson reflects the same thinking in his work, The Falsification of Afrikan Consciousness, that the problems of the black race today in seeking recognition predate the present moment. This cry has been going on since the nineteenth century, and even in American society there had always been inclusion of the black race in the activities of the nation, but this inclusivity is neutralized with a white-dominated ideology (Wilson, 2014, 7-12).
One of the most evident precarious situations of the African people is an imperial-centered economics. It is so-called because Africa is given little or no freedom to take its own destiny necessary for economic prosperity into its own power. Even under conditions where it appears to have economic policies, most of such policies are directed towards the prosperity of other continents, particularly Europe and America. Against this backdrop, the black race is miseducated into believing that the workability of an African centred economics using the African banking system is not feasible, even when such a system has proven to produce the best possible outcomes when properly utilized (Wilson, 2014, 738-740; Wilson, 2014, 45-51). In the 21st century, where emphasis is placed on ideological wars, every nation and continent is in a quick rush to out-compete the other. It would therefore be against Africa’s best interests to wait patiently for other continents to decide its fate instead of taking revolutionary steps.
In the era of colonization, peasant farmers did their jobs under the supervision of the colonial masters. Even on the peasant farmers’ own soil, the land on which they labored to sustain themselves and their families, the colonial supervisors decided how much the peasant farmers earned and determined the quantity of food that accrued to them on accomplishment of their daily tasks. Even in time of harvest, the colonial masters determined the price of the goods from the owners of the land (Andreski 26). This practice was only a rehash of what was to come several years after the colonial masters left Africa. This was a process of the satellisation of Africa, where every economic activity on African soil is directed towards the needs of Europe (Oguejiofor 39). This was not unconnected with the doctrine of the divine right of the white people to exploit the black race. Hence, even a King of France named Francis sought for a clause in “Adam’s Will” that prevented him from his own share of the wealth in Africa (Du Bois, 1999, 27; Clarke 29).
Recalling that it is these very developed nations that control the economic realities in the world, the international market forces have consistently provided the wrong outcomes for poor nations. Problems begin largely when developed nations cajole developing nations to sign up to rules that make sense and are meant for the prosperity of the already developed ones. One evident example that spans through history is the patenting of products and natural resources that emanate from African soil. King Henry VI of England is alleged to have given a letter patent to a Belgian in 1449 for a twenty-year monopoly in the production of stained glass (Bolton, 2008, 208). Some of those other natural resources patented are a hardy grain from Ethiopia called teff, which is a basic ingredient for the diet of the whole nation; an extract of the Aloe Ferox plant from Lesotho, which helps to lighten the skin; and an enzyme in Lake Nakuru in Kenya, brazzein (a protein that is said to be 500 times sweeter than sugar and gotten from a plant in Gabon). Although, this enzyme acquired from Kenya is controversial (as of 2017) because the Kenyan government denied granting permission for research in Lake Nakuru since it did not derive any benefits from this research (Bolton 209). Also, since then another evident example is the problem of patenting HIV/AIDS drugs in the guise of the Trade Related Aspects of Intellectual Property Rights (TRIP Agreement) (Peter Mugyenyi 2008). Even the establishment of lending agencies such as the International Monetary Fund and the World Bank are imperial constructions partly to exert control over developing nations within Africa. Most of the staff of these banks and lending institutions reside in Europe and America and dictate economic policies for the African continent. They fly into African capitals just occasionally on mission after which they return back to Europe and America and pronounce economic solutions for the countries in Africa in a one-fit-all-approach. Is it possible to understand the intricacies of a country’s, or a continent’s economy in this way? Instead the countries are left with long-range prescriptions that have little or no bearing on the practical realities of the African people: “It’s all but akin to a doctor trying to carry out a major medical checkup by phone” (Bolton 137). Africa is always carried away by the charade of grants and loans that emerge from these institutions but are at the same time tied to conditions that are beneficial primarily to the imperialists.
These “grants” which amount to hardly two percent of the West’s Gross National Product and inflated in their importance and size are made to appear to be generous and voluntarily given from the heart. Western aid is propagandistically made to appear to be designed to support the development and growth of the social and economic infrastructure of recipient Afrikan nations” (Wilson, 2014, 381).
They are therefore lured into adjustment programmes that lead to currency devaluation, high interest rates, privatization of state enterprise, liberalization of imports, and so on (Wilson 368-369). Eventually, the monies that go out of the African continent annually far surpass the grants and loans that come into the continent (Wilson 373). What all these then portend for the African continent is the determination of the prizes of its exported goods by Europe and America, with these economies also fixing the prices of their imports into the African continent. And because the profits that stem out of these international transactions are from the processing/manufacturing stage, the imperialists control that aspect of production too. The poor nations are left unprotected as they rely on one or two exports for their economy, which the developed nations can refuse to buy in order to force prices down. It is not enough for these developing economies to produce, they must also have markets where the goods can be sold, so that the imperialists, that primarily control the forces of demand and supply, do not have the full power to decide to close a developing economy’s markets.
The lack of vision and creativity on the part of African leaders, coupled with the fact that their bellies have become their gods, make it impossible to take initiative to open local markets to engage in transnational trade among fellow African nations. The practical result of all these nonresident tribulations is the West trying to eat its cake and have it at the same time, without in the first place giving the chefs enough ingredients to bake it (Bolton 133).
All these set the foundation for various economic Structural Adjustment Programmes that created room for a fixed economy instead of a free one. It seems, therefore, that the economic structure created by the West is unchangeable because of its inherent correctness. However, it is a structure that is considered sufficient and necessary for any economy, notwithstanding the peculiarity of a people: “Consequently, all economic systems must submit to only one law; the law of “adjustment” to an infallible and immutable economic structure” (Ramose, 2002, 4). In this new law of economics, Social Darwinism is imported into the law of capitalism, and in this law, it is insignificant how the poor end up because only the fittest survives. Each nation that then labours under a structural adjustment programme is a perpetual borrower and a consequent debtor: “that debt is expected to be paid to the faceless bankers of the West by peasant farmers who have neither health facilities, schools for their children, nor adequate shelter over their heads” (Awoonor 2006, 264).
The population of sub-Saharan Africa is fast rising, and it is expected that the growth of the economy should match the rising population. Unfortunately, the staggering realities in Africa’s economy show the contrary. With the Gross National Product of the African continent south of the Sahara (this excludes South Africa) estimated to be about the same with Belgium (a country which had a population of about 10 million in 1991), it is startling to think about the possibility of the African continent having to take care of its population that is estimated to reach 1.6 billion by the year 2030, when it was only 600 million in 1991.
It is more appalling that Africa has refused to take responsibility for its own development. Constantly relying on attractive stipend loans and grants from international agencies and institutions such as the IMF and World Bank, it makes African leaders even more unresponsive to the plight of their continent. Some African elites, as well as Western imperialists, have been beneficiaries of this corporate greed since the West deliberately make deals with corrupt African elites, who will always fall for the profit they stand to gain from such businesses. The cumulative effect would be the West singing anthems of corruption and ineptitude on the part of African leaders, even when the whole scene is a plot from both parties; both Western imperialists and African leaders have been peddlers of the same boat that sinks the African continent. This has led to agitations from Afro-centrists who demand a move from the current state of equilibrium, requesting an exit date of these international institutions away from Africa, because coupled with the crisis of irresponsibility on the part of Africans, these institutions are mere watchdogs of the progress of the African continent. The unfortunate scenario that plays out for Africans is that they provide the capital that is required to finance their oppression.
No programme can truly be considered African if it is fashioned towards the advancement of non-African cultures.
- The psychology of individuals and groups could partly be formed from “historical and experiential amnesia.” (When an individual or group is compelled by various circumstances to repress important segments of their formative history).
- “To manipulate history is to manipulate consciousness; to manipulate consciousness is to manipulate possibilities; and to manipulate possibilities is to manipulate power” (Wilson 2014, 2).
- History brings liberation.
- It creates a sense of self-identity. History creates identity and in creating identity, it also distorts identity. Part of the study of Egyptology is all about taking back Africa’s history that has been distorted, or rather stolen, by the European. Through historiography Africans can engage in the study of European history without knowing that these are mere projected myths of the reality of the African people. Hence, they can be reading history about the African people while at the same time giving credence to another race without knowing that such stories have African roots. If we don’t know ourselves, we become a puzzle unto ourselves and other persons become puzzles to us as well; therefore, we carry on a wrong identity everywhere we go.
- Socio-Political Role of History: Sometimes we ask ourselves: “Why is the study of history necessary?” “What relevance does the study of the people and cultures of Africa have for them when it cannot be translated into economic prosperity that puts bread on their tables?” It is worthy to note that there is a direct, or indirect, relationship between history and money, history and economics, history and power. The question they need to ask themselves in this regard is: “If there was no direct relation between history and power or economics, then why is it that the Europeans rewrote history?” This question calls for serious reflection.
- History and Psychology: People who have faint knowledge of history are more susceptible to manipulation than those who are knowledgeable in history. When we don’t have interest in history, all we do is to merely follow orders. We don’t need to just study computer science or mathematics, we must understand the psychology of the people who run this world. Since the study of European history is not at the centre of the high school educational curriculum, many Africans are persuaded into believing that the study of their own history is not worth it. Indeed, their ignorance of their history has a different consequence that is more injurious than the West’s ignorance of its own history. For example, a church building is a historical event so too is a bank, and this is an indication that even if individuals from the Caucasian race do not study their history, they still live with and see such historical edifice on a daily basis. History is, therefore, not only written in books, but also becomes an unwritten piece as it is lived daily. It is the past and the future all embedded in a mobile present.
- Language and Power: If it is indeed true that a creator made the universe and gave humankind the power to name things, then by having such power, humans also had dominion. There is a relationship between naming and dominion, between naming and reality. When a people then relinquish to others the authority to name and define, they permit them to have dominion and control over their being; therefore, there is a close relationship between dominion and history, as history, when actualized, guarantees dominion.
Africans have been presented with a misconstrued history about themselves and their cultures and have been labeled several derogatory titles that have their basis in colonialism. The history of the African peoples and their cultures is not the history of European plunder of African soil. They have a rich history and culture that predate colonialism.
No nation can afford to treat with levity the education of its citizens since the kind of education a people receive either make or unmake them. This is very important because a weak educational system translates into a frail economy in the future. A people’s economy is largely a reflection of the education bequeathed to them and the quality of their economy cannot be better than the quality of their education.
Fortunately, while the education received in other advanced nations prepares them to meet the demands of each age, the education bequeathed to Africans kept them in a static position. Such industrial education that was necessary to meet the challenges of every season that was and is still being received by the blacks was merely to master skills already relegated in progressive societies (Woodson, 2010, 15). This was a deliberate attempt to perpetually relinquish the blacks to the Stone Age and even the study of history has been distorted to remove Africans from the scene of events. European historiography presents the African people as a race that was once upon a time not a people, and has since been grafted into the siblinghood of humanity through Western benevolence. It is partly this distorted knowledge they have about Africa that constantly and consistently depletes their identity. No one expects masters to reproduce their own history, while at the same time exalting slaves. History, as long as it is written and taught by the conqueror, will always be written and taught to the conqueror’s advantage. Thus, when people hear names of towns and historical events such as the University of Djenne (University of Sankhore in Timbuktu), the story of the scramble for Babatus, the ploy of king Necho II, which dates as far back as 600 B.C.E. (Babatus was later renamed Cameroons), and Goshen, which is the alleged birth place of the Bible character Moses (which is actually in Egypt), what they simply do is project whiteness into them, without at the same time knowing that the renaming of cities and events in Africa was a preconceived ideology by the colonial masters since it aids in the distortion of African history. Therefore, the African people could clearly be reading history about themselves, attributing greatness to those who accomplished such historical projects, without at the same time knowing that reference is being made to their ancestors.
Looking through history and viewing some alleged treaties that Africans supposedly made with the Europeans, it is important to note that there were some forms of historical forgery made at a time when African kings had no knowledge of the English language, yet these African leaders made and signed treaties in English (Jochannan, 1991, 18). The fact that Africans along the Nile valley were already in their 13th dynastic period, even when the Biblical Abraham was born, goes to show to a large extent how they have been white-washed by the falsification of African history in order to promote and maintain Eurocentric dominance: “Colonialism brings us to a kind of history written by the conqueror for the conquered to read and enjoy. When the conquered looks around and finds that even God speaks from the heart of the conqueror, the conquered then becomes suspicious of God” (Jochannan 60).
Nobody speaks of the plunder of a virgin land, for humans only struggle for domination in a world where fellow humans live. So when Hegel referred to Africa as a continent that is unhistorical, without movement or development, it is a contradiction of the scramble for Africa that started as far back as 1675 B.C.E. (Jochannan 16) and is still being scrambled for in the present era. This same continent without a history is the same continent that transported a life of contemplative devotion into Europe; a people that had a conception of resurrection and immortality long before the Christianization of those ideas in Europe (Diop 32); and a continent that pioneered foundational patriotism in an organized form (Diop 19) with an organized political, economic, and even educational system. Even in music the African continent creates a lasting influence because one of the authentic forms of art in America is jazz, which could not have been feasible without the rhythmic structure of Africa and the drums. Even the tales and folk-lore of the people of America are not original to them (Awoonor 86; Du Bois, 1994, 7).
Therefore, there is a great need for a new historiography of the African race by the African people themselves, not a history that is based on the adventures of Europe but that is instead premised on life of the African and the very things that characterize the essence of their being.
Philosophy is literally the love of wisdom. The nature of philosophical discourse makes it possible for philosophy to thrive on criticality. Until recently, the study of philosophy in many of Africa’s colleges has been the study of the history of western thoughts. Thus, those responsible for the teaching of such disciplines in universities are always in a hurry to limit their findings to the beginning of philosophy as bequeathed to them by the Europeans, all in the bid to justify a failed deduction whose conclusion having been made, must necessarily be supported by every premise, not minding the wrongness of such foundation. Since the West therefore began its study of history with an epigram that Africa is without history, progress, and development, every study therefore must tend towards proving the said statement. It had therefore been wrongly pre-established from the onset that it was impossible for the task of philosophizing to have been done in Africa before the advent of the West. And because sometimes people misconstrue history to be the study of the past, the past for an African always begins with its plunder by Europe. Their notion of slavery takes their mind back to Africa and to the black race in general, without averting their minds to the fact that some other races outside the African race were also colonized. The history of Africa must and can only be rewritten by African scholars, as the history of a people that predates the existence of the white man on African soil. But this is possible only within a reinvented mind.
It is worth noting that students were being instructed by the Egyptian priests before the invasion of Egypt by Alexander the Great of Greece. It was within this period that the libraries in Egypt were converted into research centres by the school of Aristotle. The philosophers and scientists of this period, apart from the studies they received directly in Egypt, were also beneficiaries of the invasion as citizens of Greece. It is therefore not surprising that these philosophers were always victims of the Athenian government that always persecuted them because of ideologies that were alien to the people of Athens and were then considered unacceptable. How did they then arrive at a conclusion that ancient Greek philosophers, who were vilified for importation of thoughts that were alien to the Greek world, were actually the inventors of those ideas? The history of the life and thought of many of these prominent ancient Greek philosophers is filled with contradictions that can only be solved when we resort to faith as the arbiter of everything. Aristotle, for instance, who studied under the tutelage of Plato, became a great scientist while his tutor was a known philosopher. The fact that a philosopher could turn out a graduate in the sciences proper can only be resolved mysteriously. That Plato could keep Aristotle for a period of twenty years, tutoring him of that, which he is ignorant of himself, becomes questionable. It is therefore noteworthy that although Aristotle studied in Egypt, he made a library for himself from books that were carried from Egypt by Alexander. Plato who then studied philosophy and learnt the ten virtues in Egypt, from which he developed his own four cardinal virtues, could not have been the tutor of Aristotle (James, 2015, 1-3). This fiction continues with the fact that Theophrastus and Eudemus had studied physics, geometry, astronomy, arithmetic and theology all under Aristotle. The idea that different persons could at the same time specialize in different disciplines, some of which are distantly related, under a single tutor, is only acceptable in societies where myth is equated with reality. The fact that even the birth date of Thales is in contest bears semblance with modern day history in some societies where illiteracy makes it impossible for people to give a precise date of birth of their kindred, yet we are made to believe that this struggle among the Greeks is common with literate people. Even the positing of water as the foundation of everything that exists, or an indeterminate substance, including the theory surrounding fire, air, and so on as the primary stuff underlying everything, had long been held as a debate in Egypt; it is needful also to mention the famous Socratic dictum: “man know thyself,” which is actually an Egyptian dictum that has long been Europeanized (Obenga 2004). Since the foundation they build on is held tightly with litany of lies, it may therefore become impossible for their house to stand. People should not also forget that the history of the Greeks, during the time which the Greek philosophers were engaged in their so-called philosophical thoughts, was filled with wars and counter wars, which anyone would be quick to tell that it would be a misnomer to conceive of great intellectual strides in war-ridden areas of Iraq, Syria, Nigeria, and so on. However, it was normal for the Greeks of the ancient period under such violent and unstable conditions to be engaged in serious academic discourse. Nevertheless, like the origin of humankind that is written in favour of the white race: “this unfortunate position of the African continent and its peoples appears to be the result of misrepresentation upon which the structure of race prejudice has been built…that the African is backward, that its people are backward, and that their civilization is also backward” (James 5). The Copernican revolution used to characterize the achievement of Immanuel Kant in philosophy is another case in focus. While the name is derived from the heliocentric movement of the earth around the sun, as proposed by Nicolaus Copernicus in the 16th century, the ancestors of the Africans in Egypt had long held this heliocentric discovery in Egypt before Christ was born (B.C.) (Jackson, 1985, 24-25).
The very notion of the miseducation of the African people takes people to the question of identity crisis. One of the features of identity is the fact that it bears a relational character with that very concept, which a thing is identified with. To speak of an African identity is to have a character that is truly African and such character is not individuated, as it is shared among the same species. When a people have no identity that is uniquely theirs, they crave for any form of identity and because such identity comes from without and not within, it denigrates a people to a second order position. Because Africans carry an identity that is alien to them, there is an inbuilt inferiority complex in them. Hence, it does not matter whether they think, or feel that they are inferior or not, the inferiority is created by the existence of such institution that denies a people an identity that they can rightly call theirs. But this deliberate inferiority complex that is institutionalized has an aim, for it leads to dangerous brainwashing that further leads to self-erosion, shame, and self-alienation. Its negative impact is very broad since it erodes the relational character which identity seeks to create (Oguejiofor, 2007, 69). The war on race therefore creates a false biological determinism that makes people think that nature has endowed some races better than others and made them superior to some others. In terms of achievement, a Negro has no identity of his or her own, but they see themselves through the lens of another.
The colonial masters knew this very well; they had to destroy the foundation that made this relational character possible. For instance, the slaves in the United States of America had to be disconnected from family ties to make revolution impossible, thus destroying their loyalty system. Awoonor (2006) gives a vivid account of this identity crisis as it was and is still exemplified in the lives of the black individual. It all began with the history that was taught to the black individual and the various myths about the African race. The oppressed were taught that Africa was a land of barbarous instincts and primitive ties, where the consumption of human flesh featured prominently. The African therefore came to learn that civilization, modernization, and exposure are defined in terms of a total disconnect from African culture. This then went a long way to create an internal phobia for blackness, especially in the African-American and by such attitude, the African-Americans had phobia even for themselves. They were therefore programmed to be ashamed of their ancestry and should therefore count themselves lucky specimens that were dragged out of their homeland in chains. Being a lucky specimen, the best that could happen to the African individual is that he or she was merely worthy of observation. But the danger inherent in this type of specimen is that it is treacherous to that which is under observation, not minding whether the outcome is either positive or negative since it is still an instrument to be used, even if it is of a meritorious type. And because the debate on who is and who is not rational is the foundation of all racism, the colonial masters were in a hurry to justify the thesis of Hegel, that Africans, being a people without history but paradoxically have a history of darkness, it was illogical to conceive of them as a people with reason. They could be therefore worthy of slaves, but they must be slaves of a different kind because of their incapacity to reason, slaves of a subhuman kind that could have neither will nor freedom. Any attempt to bestow on them any knowledge that only humans were capable of grasping would be a contradiction of their irrationality.
What is most pathetic is that slavery has taken another form that has bestowed on the Africans the position of reformed serfdom. In colonial times, most slaves never saw their masters do some field work, they came to equate work with slavery while the ability to live in affluence and not work at the same time was equated with lordship. Many people of the black race therefore struggle to acquire material resources, which for them are synonymous with freedom. This is a distortion that was learnt from the colonial masters. It is worthy to note that the circumstance under which the masters acquired wealth was totally different from the thinking of the slaves. Having utilized their brains to exploit the resources on the African soil, the Europeans lived in a way that the oppressed saw as ostentatious. But since the oppressor was physically present in Africa temporarily, such exalted lifestyle was meant to shield them and their associates from the public in order to guarantee security. The oppressed having been physically free, must now struggle to live in such a gigantic way since the presence of the colonial masters on the African continent suggests that to be free, a person must be wealthy and wealth in this sense proceeds from the materiality of resources. Since the gorgeously dressed slaves who served the slave masters were the envy of fellow slaves, the black individual now equated elegance to being a master. Thus, even after the physical chains have been let loose off their arms and legs, they must still struggle to appear like the slave masters. Eventually, this desire to always look like the slave master always reminds them of their position as slaves that they truly are in their current thinking. While the blacks who can actually afford such exorbitant way of life end up as celebrities who must perform to the admiration of the masters and their households, what therefore was done under duress during colonial times due to the fear of being killed is now done willingly by those, who once oppressed, now take such acts of performance as a profession (Akbar 2014). The oppressed, therefore, moves around with the illusion that they have the mind of the master. It is a clear indication that they are far from freedom. To be ultimately free, they must understand that wealth proceeds first from the intangibility of resources, which can only be acquired from decolonizing the mind.
This was the clear-cut difference between the slaves that were prevalent in African society before colonialism and those introduced by the oppressors. In pre-colonial black Africa, slaves were in hierarchy; however, even in their hierarchical status, they were slaves of a human and not a sub-human kind. Masters, therefore, never exploited their slaves should the occasion arise since they were of different social status; while slaves exploited slaves, those of a higher social status exploited each other (Diop, 1987, 6, 10-11). This is not to downplay the role of the African in this whole predicament because when greed sets in and African leaders began to sell fellow blacks to Arabs, it opened a new page in the undermining of the identity of the black race. African leaders became more enthusiastic in the lucrativeness of such trade. This template was to be followed by the Europeans when they seized the task of enslavement from the Arabs (Williams 55). In all of this, there is still an inherent irrationality in the psyche of the conqueror, which is the fact that there was a victor. Victory in this sense arises from battle or struggle and a people must be in contest over an event or issue with certain rivals. No people need to claim victory over another as long as the preys are not armed in any sense to fight the predators; what the predators ought to simply do is to invade and not merely conquer. Victory for the conqueror should only be a natural result of the irrationality of the prey. However, this was not taken into consideration in the denial of rationality thesis to the African people as argued by the Europeans. But even the scramble for Africa in the nineteenth century was not without its own resistance. A people who have been brutally handicapped by the stroke of the pen should therefore be allowed to carve their own destiny and not be compelled to engage in a race with the rest of the developed world.
The whole concept of religion is not a coinage of the supernatural, but a formulation of humankind to bring the human person closer to the consciousness to the supersensible. The Christian religion becomes a victim in this research because large parts of Africa were colonized by nations that opined that salvation comes only through the Christian route. Thus, one of the criteria for slavery was the fact that a people or a nation was unchristian. Religious authorities operating under the form of religious tyranny gave permission to every nation in Europe to reduce every person in Africa to servitude who never accepted the Christian religion. It is an indicator that Africans have been a spiritual people before slavery since one of the primary reasons for Africa’s enslavement was that the people were not Christians. Not minding the form of religion being practiced by a people in Africa, its basis of reducing an entire race to the level of animals was the fact that they believed in the Supreme Being in a way that the Europeans did not believe. The justification for the enslavement of the African people was further given a biblical foundation. Was it therefore not a preconceived coincidence that the bible, which was used as a tool for colonialism, was given to the black individual with various verses that endorsed slavery as a divine order? It would be incongruous, and a deliberate denial, that has its foundation on irrationality, to conclude that the idea of religion was unknown to the African people before the emergence of the white individual. History, however, has revealed that there is virtually nothing that is found in Christianity that is new to the human person, except for the untrained mind. Since the African people had a vivid knowledge of the supersensible before colonialism, there must be reason(s) for the establishment of an organized religion as imported into various colonies.
When we go through the various mythologies surrounding the concept of death and the afterworld of the Bantu people of Africa, the Masarwas, the Ashanti, the Nandi and Wabende peoples of East Africa, and so on, we would understand that pre-colonial Africa did not only have organized religions, but it also had an elated form of spirituality. Thus, when Lightfoot and Ussher (Jackson 5) announced that the creation of the world dates back to 4004 B.C.E. in justification of the biblical foundations of the universe, it becomes clear that its main task was to justify a theocratic system that is based on European establishment. This is because a careful study of history shows that the 13th dynastic period of the African race predates the failed thesis of the existence of Adam and Eve. When even history records about twenty-five pre-Christian saviour-gods, all born of virgins (Jackson 38), the whole project of Christianity and its subsequent projection of the white race and the quick rush to vilify the black race is an indication that raciality and distortion are found in scripture. When even scripture is used by the oppressor to project whiteness, then it becomes evident that Christianity came in the first place, not primarily because there was a messiah to be advertised to the Africans that the conqueror wanted the oppressed to be beneficiaries, but because it fosters economic manipulation of the black race. Christianity, which therefore teaches that the end does not justify the means, uses its own end as a guide to all other means. This is seen in the use of the Babylonian baal to promote the Christian religion, while at the same time condemning such practices as pagan (Jackson 43). The worship of baal is therefore wrong in Christian theology, but the legend of the Babylonian Bel is right for propagating of Christian ideology. This use of double standards in Christian doctrine is the very standard that is used to condemn traditional religious practices in African society while at the same time using the myths of the same African religion to justify Christology. Black becomes demonic while white is used to represent everything that is honourable. It therefore leaves them amazed that while the image of God and his angelic hosts are Caucasians, the pictorial representation of the devil is black. Those who conceived this notion never averted their minds to the fact that even the devil was part of the angelic hosts before the supposed fall from grace. If everything evil has a black tag, did the devil who is the architect and bearer of evil turn black after the fall, or was he not Caucasian while he was among the angelic hosts? This Christological chauvinism has always been used to cage the African mind in a box, where slavery is justified in order to condemn everything that is African. It becomes laughable that almost everyone who encounters the divine in a vision always sees the heavenly hosts dressed in the racial colour of his or her oppressor. This gives them more reasons to justify godliness in their oppressor, while at the same time perceiving godlessness in their fellow black individuals. And since the person who controls your mind also controls your destiny, in this battle for ideological control of the civilization, the African civilization risks extinction.
Since extraction was the primary driving motive of the emergence of Christianity in Africa, one could therefore go into a church building in the guise that minds are being renewed. Renewal becomes the imperial masters’ coating of re-colonization. Where are Africans in all of these? They end up being nothing better than emancipated slaves. By this emancipation, slavery was transformed but not eliminated. An emancipated slave is one who is given the privilege of carrying the Lockean secondary quality of emancipation, while at the same time neglecting the fact that being a slave is the primary motive that makes a slave who he or she is; he or she is therefore nothing better than an exalted servant. Emancipation then becomes a profound adjective used to glorify a treacherous noun (slave). It is therefore evident from the above that Christianity and other various forms of worship, apart from being kinds of religions, are also ideologies, and like every ideology, one of its main features is to make it sellable to the masses. Real emancipation of the African would not be possible until every trace of Caucasian association with divinity is unveiled. This does not also require its substitution with black pictorial images. They must understand that ultimate liberation recognizes the supremacy of God transcending both Caucasian and black flesh, whom both races aspire to resemble in perfection and not permanently locked in a material pictorial form created by naïve minds (Akbar 68).
Freedom is not freely given, for it is always demanded with some form of revolution. In this predicament that faces the African people, the task of regaining humanity does not just lie with those whose humanity has been stolen, but also with the very persons who stole them. Dehumanization makes some persons beasts while regarding others as sub-humans. So both the beasts and the sub-humans are under a form of distortion, and they must be transformed back to a human state. This is very vital to the idea of wholesome decolonization because both the oppressed and the oppressor are afraid of freedom, for while the former fears being free, the latter fears losing the freedom to oppress (Freire, 2005, 46). Although Africans recognize the ills brought upon their colonies by their masters, the future of the African continent largely depends on the possibility of getting Africans who will drive a community-based ideology as against the egocentric lifestyle that led to its downfall in the first place and still puts the continent below other world powers. Lamentations must therefore be shifted from the West and centred on the role Africans have played over the years in the financing of its downfall. There is need for a rigorous reconstruction of the landscape of the African mind. This cannot just be done by mere bodily repatriation of Africans abroad but by the repatriation of the African mind.
- Akbar, Na’im. Breaking the Chains of Psychological Slavery. Tallahasee: Mind Productions Associates Inc. 1996.
- It gives an account of mental decolonization of the black race.
- Andreski, Stanislav. The African Predicament. London: Michael Joseph Ltd; 1968.
- It is a summary of the plights of the African race from numerous perspectives.
- Appiah, Kwame. In my Father’s House. Africa in the Philosophy of Culture. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992.
- A thought provoking discourse centred on race, culture and identity of the African.
- Awoonor, Kofi. The African Predicament. Legon: Sub-Saharan Publishers, 2006.
- Utilizing practical experiences in providing a detailed account of the plights of the African at home and abroad.
- Bernal, Martin. Black Athena. The Afroasiatic Roots of Classical Civilization. Vol. 1. New Jersey: Rutgers University Press, 1987.
- A detailed account of the fabrications and reordering of history.
- Clarke, John Henrik. Christopher Columbus and the Afrikan Holocaust. New York: A&B Books Publishers, 1992.
- A brief summary of the glorious and inglorious past of Africa.
- Diop, Cheikh Anta. Precolonial Black Africa. New York: Lawrence Hill Books, 1987.
- A summary of the life and practice of the African people prior to their contact with Europe.
- Du Bois, W.E.B. The Souls of Black Folk. New York: Dover Publications Inc; 1994.
- Largely borne out of personal experience, the book is a reflection on the plight of the black race as evident primarily in the lives of the African American.
- Du Bois, W.E.B. Darkwater: Voices from Within the Veil. New York: Dover Publications Inc; 1999.
- An autobiographical essay largely centred around black race predicament and consciousness.
- Du Bois, W.E.B. The Education of Black People. New York: Monthly Review Press, 2001.
- A critical study on how black people can acquire power from education.
- Foreman, Christopher ed. The African American Predicament. Washington D.C: Brookings Institution Press, 1999.
- This work gives an insight into plights of the black American
- Freire, Paulo. Pedagogy of the Oppressed. New York: Continuum International Publishing Group Inc; 2005.
- It is a detailed experiential account of oppression and how the oppressed could be truly free indeed.
- Harrison, Hubert. When Africa Awakes. Baltimore: Black Classic Press, 1997.
- Centred around the liberation of black people, it is an essay on race consciousness.
- Imhotep, David. The First Americans were Africans. Bloomington: AuthorHouse, 2012.
- It gives a justification of the occupation of the land of America by Africans before any other race.
- Jackson, John. Christianity Before Christ. Texas: American Atheist Press, 1985.
- In interrogating the existence of the Christian religion and how it emanates from different cultural/religious practices, it claims that nothing that Christianity projects is new.
- James, George. Stolen Legacy. The Egyptian Origins of Western Philosophy. San Bernardino, CA: A Traffic Output Publication, 2015.
- It is a summary of the existence of Greek philosophy from ancient Egypt and ways to decolonize the continent.
- Jochannan, Yosef ben & Clarke John Henrik. From the Nile Valley to the New World. Science, Invention & Technology: New Dimensions in African History. New Jersey: Africa World Press Inc; 1991.
- An historical account of the achievement of Africans in the field of science and technology.
- Mugyenyi, Peter. Genocide by Denial. Kampala: Fountain Publishers, 2008.
- A detailed account of how patenting of drugs has been used to exploit the African continent.
- Obenga, Theophile. African Philosophy. The Pharaonic Period: 2780-330 BC. Per Ankh, 2004.
- Highlighting some of the philosophical thought of ancient Egypt, it traces the origin of philosophy and presents Africa as the foundation of philosophy.
- Oguejiofor, J. Obi. Philosophy and the African Predicament. Ibadan: Hope Publications Ltd; 2001.
- On the use of philosophy in the liberation of the African continent.
- Ramose, Mogobe. African Philosophy Through Ubuntu. Harare: Mond Books, 2002.
- Using the Bantu people of Africa, the book gives an account of what African philosophy entails.
- Sertima, Ivan Van. They Came Before Columbus. The African Presence in Ancient America. New York: Random House Trade Paperbacks, 2003.
- Using archeological findings, it tells the history of the presence of the African in America prior to any other race.
- Williams, Chancellor. The Destruction of Black Civilization: Great Issues of Race from 4500 B.C. to 2000 A.D. Chicago: Third World Press, 1987.
- A thorough historical piece of the black race with a detailed account of the problems and prospects of the continent.
- Wilson, Amos. Blueprint for Black Power: A Moral, Political and Economic Imperative for the Twenty-First Century. New York: Afrikan World InfoSystems, 2014.
- An extensive book on black oppression by white supremacy and the wholesome liberation of the black race.
- Wilson, Amos. The Falsification of Afrikan Consciousness. Eurocentric History, Psychiatry and the Politics of White Supremacy. New York: Afrikan World InfoSystems, 2014.
- Journeying into the mind of the African, it suggests ways to liberate the African from the bondage of Eurocentrism.
- Woodson, Carter. The Mis-Education of the Negro. New York: Seven Treasures Publications, 2010.
- It is a concise essay on the liberation of the black man from mental and physical slavery.
Isaiah Aduojo Negedu
Federal University Lafia