Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Samuel Alexander (1859-1938)

Samuel AlexanderSamuel Alexander is best known for his role in British Emergentism, an early twentieth century movement which uses the notion of emergence to explain the relationship between mind and body. Alexander argues that mind emerges from body, in the sense that mind is dependent upon brain but not reducible to it. Alexander is also variously associated with both of the major competing ideologies of his time: realism and idealism. Because Alexander rejected idealism in favour of realism about the external world, he is sometimes associated with the Cambridge realists Bertrand Russell and G. E. Moore. But, Alexander spent his early career at Oxford – one of the focal points of British idealism – where he worked with many of the British idealists, including F. H. Bradley. Alexander’s mature metaphysical system bears deep affinities to absolute idealism, and draws on ideas from Spinoza and Hegel. Consequently, Alexander is also sometimes associated with British idealism or British Hegelianism.

Alexander’s magnum opus is Space, Time, and Deity (1920), a two volume work in which he develops an original and systematic metaphysics. Alexander is a super-substantivalist because he holds that matter is identical to spacetime. Alexander argues that space and time are the fundamental entities of the universe, and from spacetime emerges all other existents: matter emerges from spacetime, life emerges from matter, mind emerges from life, and deity emerges from mind. In his day, Alexander’s work was generally well received, and it was the subject of many studies. However, Alexander is little known in the 21st century, and his work is neglected.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Biography and Influence
  3. Early Thought and Writings
    1. Hegel and British Hegelianism
    2. Realism and Naturalism
  4. Space, Time and Deity
    1. Overview
    2. The Fundamentality of Spacetime
    3. Qualities and Categories
    4. Emergence and Spacetime
  5. Alexander and Spinoza
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

Samuel Alexander is best known for his role in British Emergentism, an early twentieth century movement which developed the notion of ‘emergence’ to explain how novel properties might emerge from underlying substrata, such as consciousness emerging from brain. Alexander is also variously associated with both of the competing philosophical ideologies of his period: British Hegelianism (sometimes known as British idealism) and British new realism (the movement that later became known as analytic philosophy).

However, in his lifetime, Alexander was well known in British philosophy for his metaphysics, particularly his highly original metaphysical system which takes spacetime to be the ontological foundation of the universe. In his magnum opus Space, Time and Deity Alexander argues that all other existents – including matter, minds and deity – emerge from spacetime in an ontological hierarchy. In addition to endorsing this early expression of ‘super-substantivalism’ (the thesis that spacetime is identical to matter) Alexander was one of the first philosophers to investigate the consequences of understanding space and time as combined into the four-dimensional manifold spacetime.

2. Biography and Influence

Alexander was born on 6 January 1859 in Sydney, Australia, the fourth child of saddler Samuel Alexander and his wife Eliza Sloman. Alexander’s father died of consumption shortly before his birth. Alexander spent his youth being educated at private schools before entering the University of Melbourne, where he gained many distinctions. In 1877 Alexander sailed to England – without having finished his Australian degree – with a view to obtaining a scholarship at the University of Oxford. Luckily, Alexander did indeed obtain a scholarship at Balliol College, and he remained at Oxford for many years. Balliol College was the home of a significant number of British Hegelians: Benjamin Jowett, T. H. Green, R. L. Nettleship and A. C. Bradley. As an undergraduate, Alexander fell under this Hegelian influence in a variety of ways, as evidenced by the early work published during his subsequent eleven year fellowship at Lincoln College (see section 2.1).

In 1893 Alexander accepted a professorship at the University of Manchester, where he taught for over thirty years and became very involved in the life of the city; for example, he strongly supported the women’s suffrage movement. In 1902 his entire family – his mother, an aunt, two brothers and a sister – emigrated from Australia to live with him. The change was apparently a great success. Alexander was appointed President of the Aristotelian Society from 1908-1911 (and again later, from 1936-1937). In 1913 he was made a fellow of the British Academy. Alexander seems to have led a happy academic career. In a speech given after his academic retirement, Alexander said: ‘I owe to the University the long thirty-one years that I was proud and happy to be a professor here, during which I tried to do my part’. For further personal autobiographical information, see John Laird’s memoir of Alexander, included in Alexander’s (1939) Philosophical and Literary Pieces. Laird was Alexander’s friend and literary executer.

In 1915 Alexander was appointed as the Gifford lecturer at the University of Glasgow. He delivered his Gifford lectures in the war years of 1917 and 1918, and these were subsequently published, under the same name, in two volumes as Space, Time, and Deity (1920). The delay between the lectures and the publication is due to the fact that Alexander found their production difficult; Laird writes that Alexander ‘was overwhelmed by a sense of his littleness in comparison with the task to which he was tied’ – the books are ‘metaphysical in the grand manner’. Nonetheless, the books were eventually published, and contain the culmination of Alexander’s work on super-substantivalism and emergence. For the most part the books were well received; Laird describes how his reviewers were in general ‘profoundly and gratefully impressed – if they were seldom convinced’. In his critical two-part book review, C. D. Broad describes how few of the Gifford lectures have been so eagerly waited as Alexander’s, and that his ingenious and original system did not disappoint.  Aside from a few short pieces that supplement these books – such as Alexander’s reply to Broad’s review in “Some Explanations” (1921) and his gloss of Spinoza’s ontology in Spinoza and Time (1921) – Alexander preferred to let the books stand alone. Alexander took real pride in the similarities between his system and that of Spinoza, despite his acknowledgement that his gloss of Spinoza’s system takes Spinoza’s work to an end that Spinoza himself would not have entertained. Laird reports that Alexander would have been very happy to have a reference to Spinoza – Erravit cum Spinoza – engraved on his funeral urn. In his late years, Alexander moved his focus from metaphysics to literary theory and aesthetics, as evidenced by his last book Beauty and other Forms of Value (1933).

Alexander died in Manchester, on 13 September 1938. In the decades following his death several studies explored his work from various vantage points. These include John McCarthy’s Naturalism of Samuel Alexander (1948), Alfred Stiernotte’s God and Space-Time (1954), Betram Brettschneider’s The Philosophy of Samuel Alexander (1964) and Michael Weinstein’s Unity and Variety in the Philosophy of Samuel Alexander (1984). Since then, interest in Alexander’s philosophy has waned.

Some commentators understand Alexander as a new realist, whilst others argue that he is substantially Hegelian. For example, McCarthy (1948) praises Alexander for his naturalism and his realism. In contrast, Brettschneider (1964) accuses Alexander of slipping absolute idealism in by the back door, on the grounds that his metaphysics involves many notions utilised by the idealists, such as coherence and concrete universals: Alexander ‘acts like Bradley and thinks like Bradley, but refuses to acknowledge the prepotency of the idealistic metaphysics in his Space-Time universe’. Alexander is genuinely a product of his generation in that he is caught in between the outgoing tide of Hegelianism and the incoming tide of new realism.

3. Early Thought and Writings

a. Hegel and British Hegelianism

The influence of British Hegelianism can be seen in Alexander’s earliest publications. One of his first published papers, “Hegel’s Conception of Nature” (1886), explores how Hegel’s understanding of nature and organism relates to contemporary science, especially the theory of evolution. In the paper Alexander interprets Hegel’s conception of space to mean that space, not matter, comes first in the logical order of nature. He adds that, for Hegel, ‘Space and Time together… involve each other and combine to produce Motion, the soul of the world, which precipitates matter in its process’ (Alexander, 1886, 503). Whether or not Alexander’s interpretation of Hegel’s conception of space is correct, this piece is important because the interpretation prefigures Alexander’s own later view that spacetime is ontologically fundamental and produces matter through a dynamical process. In other words, Alexander develops and expands a view that he takes to have much in common with Hegel.

Alexander’s first published book, Moral Order and Progress (1889), is evidence not just of Hegel’s influence on his work but also that of some of Britain’s most prominent neo-Hegelians. The book is an expansion of an essay written in 1887, for which Alexander was awarded the Green Moral Philosophy Prize. In the book’s preface, Alexander explains that he is proud to have his work connected – however indirectly – with that of T. H. Green. The book is dedicated to his former tutor, A. C. Bradley, and Alexander describes how D.G. Ritchie read the proofs, R. L. Nettleship and J. S. Haldane gave advice and F. H. Bradley – the brother of Alexander’s former tutor – went through the original essay. Alexander remained in contact with both A. C. Bradley and F. H. Bradley throughout his life. This first book attempts to show that there is at least a partial convergence between idealist ethics – of the kind advanced by Green – and evolutionary ethics. Alexander argues that both kinds of ethics recognises that there is a proportion, or relationship, between the individual and his society which is best expressed organically. Hegelian ideas permeated Alexander’s philosophy throughout his life.

b. Realism and Naturalism


In 1903 came the dual attacks on idealism from the British ‘new realists’ Russell and Moore: Russell’s Principles of Mathematics (1903) attacks the idealistic monistic doctrine of internal relations, while Moore’s “Refutation of Idealism” (1903) attacks (at least one version of) idealism. Alexander joined the rejection of idealism in print not least with his “Ptolemaic and Copernican views of the place of mind in the universe” (1909) where he compares idealism’s claim that mind is the centre of the universe to Ptolemaic geocentricism, and argues in favour of a realist revolution analogous to Copernican heliocentricism. Alexander describes idealism as the doctrine that in some sense the world is the contents of our consciousness, that things are dependent on the mind not only for being known but for their existence. Alexander rejects idealism on the grounds that it does not fit with experience. He argues that the simplest kind of apprehension of external things, such as the perception of a house or tree, contains in relation to one another two separate things – the tree and the act of perception – such that the tree is not yourself, nor dependent on yourself. Having rejected the Ptolemaic view which places mind at the centre of the universe, he argues in favour of the Copernican view, which holds that minds are merely special parts of a much larger universe.

Alexander expands on his rejection of idealism in a number of further pieces, the most important of which is “The Basis of Realism” (1914). The basic message remains the same – the experience of the relation of knower to known declares that the mind and its object are two separate existences connected together by the relation of togetherness or compresence – and this is not an argument but rather a fact of experience. However, this paper is particularly important because in it Alexander’s rejection of idealism comes paired with his acceptance of realism, the starting point of which is defined as the claim that the empirical characters of various kinds of existences is the subject-matter of the special sciences. Alexander considers himself a naturalist as well as a realist, in the sense that the physical aspect of things is pervasive.

“The Basis of Realism” is one paper of a cluster that Alexander published in a short period – others include “The Method of Metaphysics; and the Categories” (1912) and “On Relations, and in Particular the Cognitive Relation” (1912) – that explore the ideas which later appear in his magnum opus. Two of the ideas explored here are of particular importance. The first is Alexander’s repeated assertion of the reality of space and time. ‘Space and Time are, for idealism, appearances and in some respects the lowest degree of reality… But for realism the question arises whether these may not be at the foundation of all reality, and whether it may not be they which hold the world together’. This comment is interesting because although many of the British idealists – most famously, F. H. Bradley and J. M. E. McTaggart – did deny the reality of space and time, Alexander himself interpreted the idealist Hegel as placing them foremost in his ontology. The second is the idea that reality is organised into a hierarchy of layers, each of which emerges from the one before. Alexander argues that mind, or consciousness, is a new quality of existence, and that which has mind is a new kind of creature, existing at a higher level than physical or even living things.

4. Space, Time and Deity

a. Overview

In Space, Time, and Deity Alexander creates a metaphysical system with spacetime at its foundation, and deity as its culmination. He took the role of spacetime to be central. ‘It is not, I believe, too much to say that all the vital problems of philosophy depend for their solution on the solution of the problem what Space and Time are’. Alexander’s method is unusual for a philosopher in that he does not proceed by argument so much as by description: rather than arguing for his system, he simply points out how intuitive it is and how well it fits the facts of our experience. (In fact, Alexander goes so far as to claim that he dislikes argument.)

Alexander’s system can be seen to proceed via three main steps. Firstly, he describes how spacetime is real, and argues that it is identical to matter. Secondly, he describes how the nature of spacetime gives rise to two kinds of characters: qualities and categories. Lastly, he describes how mind emerges from matter and applies this idea to the universe as a whole to produce a hierarchy of existence in which each layer emerges from the next: spacetime leads to matter, matter leads to mind, mind leads to deity. The following sections will examine each step in turn.

b. The Fundamentality of Spacetime

Alexander’s arguments regarding the fundamentality of spacetime can be found in the first volume of Space, Time & Deity. Alexander begins by arguing that spacetime is real. His central argument for this claim is based on the Platonic claim that we can apprehend, or intuit, space and time directly. Alexander argues that while intuition is different from reason, the value of intuition should not be depreciated. The idea is that, whilst we cannot perceive space or time through our senses, we intuit their existence via their contents.

Having established the reality of space and time, Alexander goes on to investigate their nature. The nature of space has long been a topic of philosophical enquiry, and from the seventeenth century there has been debate as to whether space is best described by relationism or substantivalism. Relationism holds that space is not an entity or substance of any kind – it would not be included in any list of the universe’s ingredients – it merely comprises the network of spatial relations that hold between material objects. In contrast, substantivalism holds that space is an entity or substance of some kind. Although historically this debate concerned space rather than spacetime, by the early twentieth century – motivated by the work of physicists such as Minkowski and Einstein, and philosophers such as Bergson – the debate was extended to apply to time as well as space. As Alexander puts it, the early twentieth century began to ‘Take Time Seriously’. In his discussion, Alexander takes himself to be choosing between relationism and substantivalism. He argues that while relationism is a legitimate view, it does not represent our direct, intuitional apprehension or experience of space or time. Having rejected relationism, Alexander turns to substantivalism.

The substantivalist can take one of two stances on the status of material (or immaterial) objects. Dualistic substantivalism holds that space and material objects coexist as distinct kinds of substances. Super-substantivalism holds that space is the only kind of substance, and matter is identical to it. Alexander assumes that, given the nature of spacetime as he understands it, super-substantivalism follows automatically. This is because, for Alexander, it is the very nature of spacetime to give rise to material objects. This is because spacetime is identified with ‘Motion’, and it is Motion which produces material objects. This identification is one of Alexander’s most fundamental claims, and unfortunately it is also one of the most obscure.

The identification has its roots in the fact that Alexander conceives of space and time not as independent substances but rather as interdependent ones. He gives us two arguments for this. Firstly, there is the argument from physics: physicists such as Minkowski and Einstein claim that space and time should now be considered as the four dimensional manifold spacetime. Secondly, there is Alexander’s difficult (and heavily criticised – see Broad) a priori argument. Essentially, Alexander argues that it is space which lends time continuity and variety: if time existed independently of space, time would consist of perishing instants, which would lack continuity and succession. Similarly, Alexander argues that it is time which gives space distinct parts: without time, space would consist of a sheer homogeneous blank without distinct parts. It is this second argument which leads Alexander to claim that time is the source of movement, and hence the source of motion. As time moves through space, it produces matter – variegated, continuous complexes of spacetime – in its process. ‘Space-Time is a system of motions, and we might call Space-Time by the name of Motion’.

Later in his system, Alexander describes how there is a ‘nisus’ in spacetime – a striving force – which carries its creatures upwards through the various levels of existence to the highest level of deity. Both spacetime and the nisus are creative: time introduces a restlessness into space that culminates in motion, and the nisus drives spacetime to produce ever newer forms of existence. It is not entirely clear what the relationship between spacetime and the nisus is supposed to be; there are two possible readings of Alexander on this issue. On the first reading, the nisus is the motion of spacetime. On the second reading, the nisus is an extra ingredient added to spacetime, which acts as a kind of organisational principle on the complexes of motion that emerge from spacetime. For more on this, see Emmet (1950).

Alexander’s identification of spacetime with ‘a single vast entity Motion’, along with his introduction of a nisus, provides the foundation for his entire ontology, for it is the many individual motions within Motion that constitute all other existents, from material objects to minds. And this is why Alexander is a super-substantivalist, rather than a dualistic substantivalist: it is the very nature of spacetime to produce the motions that are all other existents, and as such there is no need to even consider postulating another substance (such as matter, or mind) distinct from spacetime to explain their existence.

c. Qualities and Categories

For Alexander, existing things are continuously connected groupings of motions, connected through spacetime. These things, or motions, have characters, some of which are variable and some of which are pervasive. For example, the character of an apple is always substantial but it changes from red to brown. Pervasive characters are ‘categories’, and they apply in some form to all existents, from material objects to minds. In contrast, variable characters are ‘qualities’ – such as colour, shape or consciousness – that existents can have or not have.

The categories include identity, substance, universality, order, diversity, magnitude and number. The fact that these categories apply to all things is no coincidence: the categories are the fundamental properties of spacetime. For example, the categories of identity, diversity and existence arise out of the intrinsic nature of spacetime ‘as a continuum of parts’ which are themselves spaces and times. All things that exist are subject to the category of existence because they occupy spacetime, and that is what it is to exist. Similarly, all things that exist are self-identical and diverse from all other things because, as we saw above, time gives space distinct parts and vice versa. Existence, identity and diversity are but a few of the categories – there are many more. Two categories deserve a special mention. The first is that of substance, which for Alexander is any ‘contour of space’. For Alexander, all existents are substances – even a simple motion in a straight line – for all existents are subject to the categories. The second is whole and parts. Just as time and space break up into wholes of parts, so individual wholes within spacetime break up into parts. Alexander concludes that everything exhibits categorical features.

d. Emergence and Spacetime

Emergence is the notion that novel properties ‘emerge’ out of more fundamental properties or entities. In contemporary philosophy of mind, the notion is sometimes used to explain how consciousness emerges from brain. In addition to Alexander, emergentism has its primary roots in the work of early twentieth century British philosophers C. Lloyd Morgan and C. D. Broad. Part of the motivation underlying emergentism in the philosophy of mind is the desire to naturalise the mind yet acknowledge its novel nature. Alexander’s emergentist conception of the mind directly informs his super-substantivalism. 

Alexander explicitly acknowledges his intellectual debt to Morgan for his emergent understanding of mind, explaining that he has even chosen the term ‘emergent’ after the example of Morgan. Morgan explains that emergence can be used to explain the ‘genuinely new’ things that sometimes occur in the process of Darwinian evolution. Alexander adapts this account for his own ends, arguing that experience leads us to connect our mental processes with our body, to locate our mental processes in the same places and times as certain neural processes. Alexander explains the correlation between mind and brain in virtue of the fact ‘they are not two but one’: conscious processes are neural processes. The idea is that once neural processes reach a certain level of development, the quality of mentality or consciousness is achieved. This quality of mental process is ‘something new, a fresh creation’, that emerges out of matter. Alexander is careful to emphasise that, as on Morgan’s conception, his conception of mind and brain is not a parallelism of two distinct entities but instead a species of identity doctrine: the mental process and its neural process are one and the same existence, not two existences. O’Connor and Wong argue that Alexander’s characterisation of emergentism – which they paraphrase as the claim that ‘Emergent qualities are novel qualities that supervene on a distinctive kind of physico-chemical process’ – is very close in detail to a standard form of non-reductive physicalism in contemporary philosophy of mind, wherein mind is identical but not reducible to the brain (O’Connor & Wong, 2009, 8).

Alexander conceives of nature as layered into a hierarchy of existents, ascending in complexity. For Alexander, it is not just the case that mind emerges from matter, matter also emerges from spacetime. His system can be illustrated as follows:

Levels of being Structure Quality
Space and time Motion
Matter Individual complexes of motion Corporeality
Organisms Physio-chemical processes Life
Man Body Consciousness
God The whole world Deity

Alexander’s strategy to realise this hierarchy is simple. He takes the idea of emergence as it applies to the mind and brain, and applies it to space and time. Just as mind and body are ‘indissoluble and identical’, so are space and time. The only way in which the analogy fails to hold is that our minds are a new quality which emerge from our bodies, whereas time is not a new quality that emerges from space. ‘Space and Time only exists with the existence of the other, and their relation is such as we might imagine that of mind and brain to be if neuro-mental processes could subsist by themselves without their presuppositions in a larger vital and hence in a physic-chemical world of things’. In connection to this thesis, Alexander famously claims that ‘Time is the mind of Space’. This does not mean that time is conscious in any way, it merely means that time performs the same function for space as mind does for the body. This function is that time allows new qualities (such as colour or consciousness) to emerge because time is the source of motion, and it is individual motions which have qualities. The fundamental level of nature is spacetime or motion, from which proceeds the individual motions which take on the emergent qualities of matter, life and mind. An important difficulty concerning Alexander’s application of mind-body emergence to the universe as a whole is raised by Emmet (1950). Emmet points out that when giving a general worldview in terms of an analogy drawn from a special field – in this case the psycho-physical relation –  it is surely necessary that the initial relation from which the analogy is drawn should itself be clearly understood. This particular relation is not at all clear – the relation between the body and mind is one of the most difficult problems of philosophy – and as such Emmet worries that Alexander’s whole project is an attempt to explain an obscurity using a further obscurity.

Alexander’s emergentism explains how it is that spacetime gives rise to matter, mind and life. All that is left on his system is to explain how spacetime gives rise to deity. Alexander offers us a metaphysical definition of God, whereby God is that which possesses ‘deity or the divine quality’. He then sets out to show us that, whilst mind or consciousness is the highest quality that we know of in the universe, deity is even higher. The nisus in spacetime will not cease with mind, it will bring its creatures forward to some higher level of existence. Deity has not yet emerged in the universe – ‘deity is not actual but ideal’ – but, as Alexander paraphrases Leibniz, the world is big with it. Alexander is careful to point out that this ideal emergent deity is distinct from spacetime itself, arguing that while spacetime can be intuited it cannot be worshiped. Alexander’s notion of deity is somewhat obscure. For example, it is not clear whether deity should emerge from one particular human consciousness, or from many.

5. Alexander and Spinoza

Whilst producing the metaphysical system expressed in Space, Time and Deity, Alexander was apparently unaware of the similarities between his system and that of Spinoza. His inspirations  were Plato and Kant, and Alexander only belatedly realised the import of Spinoza’s doctrines. However, once Alexander realised the resemblance, he took it very seriously, citing Hegel’s saying ‘that to be a philosopher a man must first be a Spinozaist’. Alexander produced two pieces exploring the connections between his system and that of Spinoza – Spinoza and Time (1921a) and “Lessons from Spinoza” (1928) – and he goes so far as to express his system as a ‘gloss’ of Spinoza. Alexander was impressed not just by Spinoza’s metaphysics but also by the way that Spinoza combined naturalism with a profound sense of religion and value. This is, of course, exactly the combination that Alexander had tried to produce himself.

In describing Alexander’s gloss of Spinoza, we will focus on Alexander’s interpretation of Spinoza (for alternative interpretations, see the main IEP article “Spinoza”). As described above (section 3.2) the seventeenth century philosophers took space seriously but they neglected time; Alexander aims to reinvent Spinoza’s system in light of his contemporary resolve to take time seriously. Alexander sets out to investigate the difference it would make to Spinoza’s philosophy if we were to assign to time a position not allowed to it by Spinoza himself, but suggested by the difficulties – and even obscurities – in it. Alexander understands Spinoza the following way. Spinoza holds that just one substance exists, which does not depend on anything else for its existence or explanation: everything that exists in nature is in God and are modifications of him. God can be apprehended through two attributes, thought and extension, which are but two forms of one and the same reality. Already the similarities between Alexander and Spinoza’s systems are emerging: both philosophers hold that there is one substance which is the ontological ground of the universe as a whole, and that this single substance is the ground of both matter and mind.

Alexander describes Spinoza’s conception of space and time as follows. Spinoza understands spatial extension as an attribute of God. When we speak of individual lengths or spaces we are confused – we are not dealing with reality, except of the imagination – because space (or extension) is really a partless God under a certain attribute. Individual spaces are contrasted with this divine attribute of space. Between God as perceived under the attribute of extension, and the finite extended modes which are spatial bodies, there are infinite modes – motion and rest – which ‘break the fall from Heaven to Earth’. It is these modes which break up the unity of God’s extension into a multiplicity, in the same way that time breaks up Alexander’s space into parts. Of course, Spinoza denies that God actually has parts, and Alexander argues that is one of the weaknesses of Spinoza’s system that the parts are submerged within the whole rather than conspiring in semi-independence towards it. This weakness aside, Alexander sets out to understand how the infinite modes break up the unity of God. He argues that Spinoza takes it as axiomatic that bodies are all either in motion or at rest –  in other words, bodies are complexes of motions – and that Spinoza believes this because extension expresses God’s essence, and as such is alive. Alexander finds this explanation for why bodies are axiomatically in motion or at rest unsatisfactory because life implies change, and change implies time, yet time is excluded from the nature of God who is merely timeless. As Alexander explains, Spinoza understands time very differently to space. For Spinoza, durations of time, even conceived of parts of an indefinite duration, are not real realities. Time (or duration) is not an attribute of God so individual times cannot be contrasted with it in the way that space as an attribute of God is contrasted with individual spaces.

Alexander aims to describe Spinoza’s system as it would be if Spinoza did accept time as an attribute of God, arguing that this would solve Spinoza’s unsatisfactory explanation of motion. In this ‘gloss’ of Spinoza, God’s extension should not be merely understood as spatial, but as spatio-temporal. In Alexander’s gloss, the ultimate reality is full of time, it is the theatre of constant change, such that reality is spacetime or motion itself. Alexander believes that this addition solves another problem in Spinoza, namely the apparent gulf between the divine substance and its modes: ‘there is now no ditch to jump between the ultimate ground of things and things in themselves; for things are… but complexes of motion and made of the stuff which the ultimate or a priori reality is’. Just as Alexander allows that individual existing things are not engulfed, but rather conserved, in his single substance, so Spinoza can allow the same. Just as spacetime is motion on Alexander’s system, and this creates novel substances such as matter and minds, so God is a ceaseless creator in Spinoza’s system.

A consequence of Alexander’s gloss is that the hierarchy of modes described in Spinoza’s system becomes a temporal, as well as a logical series. The highest level of this series that we are aware of is that of thinking things, which entails that thought is no longer an attribute of God but rather a quality of the highest level of existents. Time has displaced thought in Spinoza’s scheme. Furthermore, as the two attributes we have been discussing – space and time – can do everything that is needed to do on Spinoza’s scheme, there is no need to postulate any further attributes of God, known or otherwise. ‘Space and Time are seen to exhaust the attributes of reality’ (Alexander, 1921a). A further – and much more radical – consequence of Alexander’s gloss is that spacetime can no longer be identified with, or understood as an attribute, of God. This is because, as Alexander points out in his own system, spacetime cannot be an object of worship. In order to place deity within his gloss, Alexander looks to Spinoza’s conatus doctrine, according to which everything strives to persist in its being. Alexander argues that Spinoza understood the notion of conatus as a metaphysical conception, rather than a biological one, and consequently it is difficult to understand. This is because, for Alexander, the conatus doctrine is best illustrated in organic beings – where the plant or animal maintains its single individuality of being, abandoning it only to external violence or internal decay – although it can be found in inanimate stones or atoms as well: an atom persists in its being so far as the motions of its planetary system of electrons, moving round their central nucleus, are conserved. On Alexander’s gloss, the roots of the conatus doctrine are to be found in the restlessness of spacetime, which ‘falls of itself’ into the complexes of motion which are bodies; in turn these forms evolve into new orders of beings with new characters and their own conatus to persevere in their type. In accordance with his own system, Alexander gives this conatus a new name – ‘nisus’ – and it is this biological striving that we observe in organic bodies and atoms. This nisus also gives rise to a level of existence higher than minds, such that God becomes the world as a whole with a nisus towards deity.

In typically poetical style, Alexander describes the conclusion of his gloss of Spinoza as follows:

[If] the reality in its barest character is Space-Time, the face of the whole universe is the totality of all those configurations into which Space-Time falls through its inherent character of timefulness or restlessness… [the] stuff of reality is not stagnant, its soul’s wings are never furled, and in virtue of this unceasing movement it strikes out fresh complexes of movements, all created things (Alexander, 1921a).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Alexander, Samuel (1886) “Hegel’s Conception of Nature”. Mind Vol. 11, pp. 495-523.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1909)“Ptolemaic and Copernican views of the place of Mind in the Universe”. The Hibbert Journal Vol. VIII.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1912) “The Method of Metaphysics, and the Categories”. Mind Vol. 21, 1-20
  • Alexander, Samuel (1912) “On Relations; and in particular the Cognitive Relations”. Mind Vol. 21, 305-328.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1914)“The Basis of Realism”. Proceedings of the British Academy Vol. V, 279-314
  • Alexander, Samuel (1920i) Space, Time and Deity. Macmillan & Co Ltd: London.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1920ii) Space, Time and Deity. Macmillan & Co Ltd: London.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1921a) Spinoza and Time. Unwin Brothers, Ltd: GB.Alexander, Samuel (1921b) “Some Explanations”. Mind Vol. 30, pp. 409-428.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1928) “Lessons from Spinoza”. Chronicon Spinozanum Vol. 5, 14-29.
  • Alexander, Samuel (1939) Philosophical and Literary Pieces. Edited by John Laird. Macmillan & Co: Great Britain.
    • [Includes a memoir of Alexander by Laird]

b. Secondary Sources

  • Brettschneider, Betram (1964).The Philosophy of Samuel Alexander. Humanities Press: USA.
  • Broad, C. D. (1921). “Professor Alexander’s Gifford Lectures” [two parts] Mind Vol. 30.
    • [Critically discusses particular aspects of Alexander’s Space, Time & Deity, such as Alexander’s identification of spacetime and motion]
  • Emmet, Dorothy (1950). “Time is the mind of space”, Philosophy Vol. 25, pp. 225-234.
    • [Explains Alexander’s application of mind-body emergence to the universe as a whole]
  • Leighton, Joseph (1922). Man and the Cosmos. D. Appleton & Company: USA.
    • [Contains a limited summary of Alexander’s super-substantivalism]
  • McCarthy, John (1948). The Naturalism of Samuel Alexander. Macmillan & Co, Ltd: USA.
  • Murphy, Arthur E. (1927) “Alexander’s Metaphysic of Space-Time” [multiple parts]. The Monist, Vol, 38.
    • [Tackles particular issues in Space, Time & Deity such as Alexander’s theory of categories]
  • O’Connor, Timothy & Wong, Hung Yu (2009). “Emergent Properties” in Stanford Encyclopaedia of Philosophy.
    • [Discusses the history of British emergentism, including Alexander’s contribution]
  • Stiernotte, Alfred (1954). God and Space-Time. Philosophy Library: USA.
    • [Study of Alexander’s philosophy; contains detailed discussion of pantheism]
  • Thomas, Emily (2013). “Space, Time, and Samuel Alexander”. British Journal for the History of Philosophy 21: 549-569.
  • Weinstein, Michael (1984). Unity and Variety in the Philosophy of Samuel Alexander. Purdue University Press: USA.


Author Information

Emily Thomas
Cambridge University
United Kingdom

Last updated: May 29, 2012 | Originally published: