Ever since Darwin created his theory of evolution in the nineteenth century, and especially since the nineteen sixties, scientists and philosophers of science have been intensely debating whether and how selection occurs at the level of the group. The debates over group selection maintain their vitality for several reasons: because group selection may explain the evolution of altruism; because “altruistic” traits ─ traits that reduce an individual’s fitness while increasing the fitness of another ─ constitute a well-known puzzle for the theory of natural selection; because altruism is a phenomena that one seems to encounter daily in biology and society; and because altruism via group selection may explain some major evolutionary transitions in the history of life (such as the transition from separate molecules into a gene, from individual genes into a chromosome, from individual cells into a multi-cellular organism, and from multi-cellular organisms turning into a social group).
After so many years of unresolved debates, one is prone to ask: Is the group selection debate merely waiting for more data and experimentation, or are there further issues that need clarification? One type of dispute is semantic, requiring examination of the various meanings of “altruism,” “group” and “unit of selection.” Another type of dispute regards heuristic strategies, such as the assumption that phenomena similar in one respect, however dissimilar in other aspects, call for a similar explanation or a similar causal mechanism. This strategy encourages the parties to seek a single evolutionary explanation or a single selection process to drive the evolution of altruistic traits. Finally, there could be values and visual images, historically entrenched in favor of a particular kind of explanation or against it. This article develops some major historical, empirical, conceptual and practical aspects of the debates over group selection.
Selection among groups rather than individuals is not a straightforward idea, especially not ontologically. Nonetheless, the notion of group selection is often used in evolutionary discourse, especially for explaining the evolution of altruism or sociality (the tendency to form social groups). The meaning of “altruism” in ordinary language is quite different from its use among evolutionary biologists (Sober and Wilson, 1998, pp. 17-18). An ultimate motivation of assisting another regardless of one’s direct or indirect self-benefit is necessary for it to be altruistic in the ordinary sense ─ for what we might call moral altruism (see psychological egoism). However, motivations and intentions are not accessible to someone studying non-humans. Thus, they are not part of the meaning of “altruism” in the biological sense. Biological altruism is a course of action that enhances the expected fitness of another at the expense of one’s own fitness. Whether altruism occurs depends on several things: on the population’s initial conditions, on the definition of “altruism” as absolute or relative fitness reduction ─ that is, whether one suffers a net loss or not (Kerr et al. 2003) ─ and on the meaning of “fitness” as an actuality or propensity (Mills and Beatty, 1979). Unlike ordinary speech, in biological discourse a trait that carries a cost to the individual, even if relatively small and with no net reduction of fitness, is typically labeled “altruistic” or, equivalently, “cooperative.”
These distinctions between ordinary and technical senses of “altruism” notwithstanding, many scientists often link them in the evolutionary debates over group selection. Connecting biological and moral altruism is typically done without conflating the two, that is, without committing the naturalistic fallacy of “is implies ought.” An example of such a fallacy might be: since group selection is found everywhere in nature, we should act for the benefit of the group. Instead, some scientists argue that the abundance of group selection processes throughout human evolution can explain why humans sometimes hold genuinely altruistic motivations (for example, Darwin, 1871; Sober and Wilson, 1998, part II). Others argue that moral altruism should be praised with extra vigor, since the process of group selection hardly – if ever – occurs in nature, so human altruism is not “in harmony” with nature but rather a struggle against it (Dawkins, 1976; Williams, 1987). In short, linking “altruism” with “group selection” is historically very common although conceptually not necessary. As we shall see below, a process of group selection can act on non-altruistic traits and the evolution of a cooperative trait need not always require a group selection process. Karl Popper (1945) blamed Plato for the historical identification of the moral concept of altruism with collectivism and for contrasting altruism to individualism:
Now it is interesting that for Plato, and for most Platonists, altruistic individualisms cannot exist. According to Plato, the only alternative to collectivism is egoism; he simply identifies all altruism with collectivism; and all individualism with egoism. This is not a matter of terminology, of mere words, for instead of four possibilities, Plato recognized only two. This has created considerable confusion in speculation on ethical matters, even down to our own day (Popper, 1945, p. 101).
Whether due to Plato or local circumstances within the nineteen-century scientific community, “altruism” and “group selection” have been linked from the origin of evolutionary biology.
Ever since Darwin, “altruism” and “group selection” are found together (Darwin, 1859, p. 236; Lustig, 2004). Darwin, in his 1871 book The Descent of Man, pointed to a selection process at the group level as an evolutionary explanation for human altruism:
When two tribes of primeval man, living in the same country, came into competition, if (other things being equal) the one tribe included a great number of courageous, sympathetic and faithful members, who were always ready to warn each other of danger, to aid and defend each other, this tribe would succeed better and conquer the other (Darwin, 1871, p. 113).
Such altruistic behavior seems to raise a problem for a theory of natural selection, since:
It is extremely doubtful whether the offspring of the more sympathetic and benevolent parents, or of those who were the most faithful to their comrades, would be reared in greater numbers than the children of selfish and treacherous parents belonging to the same tribe. He who was ready to sacrifice his life, as many a savage has been, rather than betray his comrades, would often leave no offspring to inherit his noble nature (Darwin, p. 114).
Given this characterization, one might think that altruistic traits would gradually disappear. Yet such traits appear quite common in nature. Darwin suggests several mechanisms within a single group to explain the puzzle of the evolution of altruism – such as reciprocal reward and punishment – that often benefit the benevolent individual in the long run relative to others in his or her group. In other words, Darwin points to selection at the level of the individual rather than the group, which renders morally praised behavior non-altruistic in the biological sense. Yet Darwin immediately makes it clear that selection between groups is the dominant process selecting for human morality, since whatever forces might act within that tribe, the disparity in accomplishment is greater between tribal groups than within each group:
It must not be forgotten that although a high standard of morality gives but a slight or no advantage to each individual man and his children over the other men of the same tribe, yet that an increase in the number of well-endowed men and an advancement in the standard of morality will certainly give an immense advantage to one tribe over another. A tribe including many members, who from possessing in a high degree the spirit of patriotism, fidelity, obedience, courage and sympathy, were always ready to aid one another, and to sacrifice themselves for the common good, would be victorious over most other tribes; and this would be natural selection (Darwin, 115-116).
Since Darwin, and with a similar naturalistic stance, biologists have continued to try to explain altruism – in humans and non-humans alike – via group selection models. Assuming that group selection does not conflict with individual selection was a common uncritical presumption until World War II (Simpson, 1941). The three decades to follow marked a dramatic change. Historians such as Keller (1988) and Mittman (1992) showed that during the 1950s and 1960s, many Anglo-American researchers came to identify altruism with conformity – and with being a tool of totalitarianism – while viewing conflicts of interests as crucial for the checks and balances of a functioning democracy. Vero C. Wynne Edwards’s attempt at a grand synthesis of all population dynamics under the process of group selection (Simpson, p. 20) is an example. The attack on group selection, although already a long-standing element of David Lack’s controversy with Wynne-Edwards (Lack, 1956), became the focus of attention largely due to John Maynard Smith’s 1964 paper and George C. Williams’ 1966 book Adaptation and Natural Selection.
Williams (1966) advocated the parsimony of explaining seemingly sacrificial behavior without evoking altruism (in the sense of absolute reduction in fitness) or the mysterious mechanism of selection at the group level, but rather via the fitness benefits to the individual or the gene involved. A “gene’s eye-view,” employed by Maynard Smith and Williams, was given its most general form in William D. Hamilton’s 1964 papers. “Hamilton’s rule,” often used interchangeably with “kin selection” (Frank, 1998, pp. 4, 46-47; Foster et al., 2005), states that an altruistic gene will increase its frequency in a population if the ratio between the donor’s cost (c) and the beneﬁt to the recipient (b) is less than the coefficient of (genetic) relatedness between the donor and recipient (r); that is, r > c / b. In other words, a gene for altruism (that is, an abstract gene type, not a material stretch of DNA nor a specific gene token) will spread in the population if enough organisms with an above average chance to carry that gene – that is, relatives – will be better off due to the altruistic act even if the individual organism must sacrifice its life. It should be clear that the altruistic “trait,” explained in these “gene’s eye view” models, is no more than a quantified disposition to act altruistically given certain initial circumstances. Such gene centered models offered in the nineteen sixties by Hamilton, Maynard Smith, and Williams, and assembled in the nineteen seventies under Richard Dawkins’s The Selfish Gene (1976) and Edward O. Wilson’s Sociobiology (1975), appeared to have ended the idea of group selection altogether (although Wilson did use “group selection” for his gene-centered synthesis). Finally a single unifying model was offered to solve Darwin’s “difficulty” with no reference to mechanisms at the level of the group.
Both these books quickly became best sellers, though not everyone accepted the gene’s eye-view, either as an actual causal process of selection (Gould, 1980, Ch. 8; Sober and Lewontin, 1982) or as a useful heuristic (Wimsatt, 2007, Ch. 4-5, which reorganize Wimsatt’s 1980 and 1981 papers). Gene selection opponents granted that the outcomes of selection are often conveniently described in genetic terms for the purpose of “bookkeeping” the records of evolution. However, they argued, the gene’s eye-view fails to test the causes that produced such an outcome (Davidson, 2001). In other words, employing a model that only measures average change in gene frequency in a population may be adequate for predicting biological events yet inadequate for explaining why and how they actually occurred. These objections to gene selection are not only heuristic but also metaphysical (Agassi, 1998), since they guide one’s practice to seek observations of different events rather than differently describe the same events.
The objections to gene selection notwithstanding, throughout the heated controversy over Wilson’s, and to a lesser degree Dawkins’s, book, “group selection” was not a viable alternative (Lewontin et al., 1984). Things began to change only nearing the nineteen eighties, when David S. Wilson (1975), Michael J. Wade (1976, 1978), Dan Cohen and Ilan Eshel (1976) and Carlo Matessi and Suresh D. Jayakar (1976) independently reexamined the theory. D. S. Wilson is perhaps the biologist most closely associated with reviving the idea of group selection. In Wilson’s (1975) trait-group selection model, any set of organisms that interacts in a way that affects their fitness is a group, regardless of how short lived and spatially dissolved this group is. Wilson further demonstrated that even when an altruist loses fitness relative to an egoist within every group, the variance in fitness between groups – favoring those groups with more altruists – can override the variance in fitness within each group – favoring an egotist over an altruist ─ and thus selection at the group level can override selection at the individual level. This variance in group fitness could be inherited in many population structures, including those required for kin selection (Maynard Smith, 1964) and reciprocity (Trivers 1971; Axelrod and Hamilton’s 1981). Thus, Wilson could show that his model incorporates seemingly competing models as instances of group selection.
Cohen and Eshel (1976) and Matessi and Jayakar (1976) models clearly showed how group selection might occur in nature and that it might not be rare at all. In addition to modeling, Wade (1976, 1980) conducted laboratory experiments (mainly on red flower beetles Tribolium castaneum) that demonstrated the strong causal effects of group selection in a given population. Wade compared the evolutionary response of an inter-group selection process (that is, selection between reproductively isolated breeding groups in a population) to a process of kin selection (that is, selection between groups of relatives in a population with random mating within a common pool) to a random process (that is, selection between groups chosen at random) and to a process of individual selection (that is, selection within groups in each of these population structures). His theoretical and empirical results demonstrated the causal importance of the group selection process during evolution. That is, when group selection was taking place it generated an evolutionary response over and above all the other processes, easily detectable even when individual selection or a random process promotes the same trait as group selection, that is, even when affecting a non-altruistic trait (Griesemer and Wade, 1988).
Since the early nineteen eighties, philosophers of biology became involved in the debates surrounding group selection (Hull, 1980; Sober and Lewontin, 1982; Brandon, 1982, 1990; Sober, 1984; Griesemer, 1988; Lloyd, 1988; Sober and Wilson, 1994); and gradually “group selection” (sometimes called “multi-level selection”) became a dominant view in philosophy of science (Lloyd, 2001; Okasha, 2006). One cannot say the same about evolutionary biology, where the gene’s eye-view is still a dominant scientific perspective.
Thirty years after the publication of Sociobiology, however, E. O. Wilson has revised the importance of kinship in relation to altruism (Wilson and Hölldobler, 2005). Originally, E. O. Wilson thought the answer to “the central theoretical problem” of altruism – in humans and non-humans alike – was all about kinship (Wilson and Hölldobler, p.3). Now Wilson argues for a minor evolutionary effect, if any, of kin ties in the evolution of high-level social organization (“eusociality”) and commits to D. S. Wilson’s model of trait-group selection (D. S. Wilson and E. O. Wilson, 2007). This disagreement over the evolution of cooperation via group selection is still very much alive in biology and philosophy. Clarifying some of the concepts involved may help understand its dynamics.
The concept of group selection refers to three different, albeit often overlapping, issues: the ﬁrst involves selection, the second adaptation, and the third evolutionary transitions. For studying selection, it is necessary to determine whether variations in ﬁtness and in trait frequency between groups exceed those variations within groups (Price, 1972; Sober and Lewontin 1982; Sober and Wilson, 1998), and whether this variance is a mere statistical by-product of selection acting between individuals or an actual causal effect of a selection process that took place at the group level (Sober, 1984; Okasha, 2006).
In addition, for studying group adaptation additional information is required on group-heritability (Lloyd, 1988; Brandon 1990; Wade, 1978, 1985; Okasha, 2006), that is, whether and how does an average trait in a daughter group resemble the average trait in the mother group more than it resembles the population mean? Is this statistical resemblance between mother and daughter group, if found, a result of random or group-structured mating in the population? Is it regularly expected in a given population structure or a product of chance, in the sense of an irregular event?
The third issue concerns how the evolutionary transition from solitary organisms to social groups occurred (Maynard Smith and Szathmáry 1995, Jablonka and Lamb, 2005). That is, it concerns how various cooperative adaptations have combined to bring about systematic altruism, so that individuals have lost their independent reproduction and mate only within the larger encompassing whole or social group. In this third type of question, one cannot assume a group structure already exists in the population in order to explain the evolution of altruism within such population – as did Darwin and many others – nor even assume that a gene for altruism already exists – as did Hamilton and many others; rather, one must explain how societies, phenotypes and genotypes emerge and co-evolve (Griesemer, 2000).
The notions of group selection and group adaptation both rely upon the meaning of a “unit of selection.” A unit of selection shows phenotypic variance, ﬁtness variance, and heritability of traits relating to ﬁtness (Lewontin 1970). Lewontin has shown that multiple structural units – for example, genotype, organism, and group – could hold the conditions of a unit of selection. However, the function of a unit of selection is still under conceptual dispute. Is the function of a unit of selection to replicate itself from generation to generation (Dawkins, 1976) or is it to interact with its environment in a way that causes differential reproduction (Hull 1980). Focusing on the function of a unit of selection as a replicator, means that the gene is the “real” or major unit of selection, since an organism that reproduces sexually replicates only one half of its traits on average, and a group that splits into daughter groups has an even smaller chance to replicate its trait, for example, its frequency of altruists, to the next generation of groups. Alternatively, viewing the “unit of selection” as an interactor means that a single gene cannot be a unit of selection but only whole genomes (that is,, individuals) and perhaps groups could function as such units.
But must one choose a single perspective for explaining the evolution of altruism? Kitcher, Sterelny and Waters (1990) argue for a pluralist view that suggests several equally adequate models one can use for representing the same facts. Kerr and Godfrey-Smith (2002) develop this pluralistic view into a mathematical representation, which fully translates the unit of the group from a mere background for its individuals ─ that is, “group’ as contextual” ─ to an emergent unit as a whole ─ that is, “group” as a “collective” ─ and vice versa. The advantage of pluralism in this case is that one need not decide which process actually took precedent ─ for example group selection or individual selection ─ in explaining and predicting the evolution of altruism.
Yet pluralism comes with a price if one wishes to understand the evolution of altruism via its evolutionary casual process. In the history of science, translatability of competing models relative to a body of empirical knowledge repeatedly called scientists and philosophers to search for additional observations and/or experiments that will “break the tie” and decide which model to uphold (Agassi, 1998). In the debates over the evolution of altruism, Lloyd, (2005), Wimsatt (2007, Ch. 10) and Griesemer (2006) argue that in most cases – or at least in the interesting cases where a casual process might be operating at the level of the group – interchangeable abstract models require one to minimize empirical details about population structure and dynamic, which are necessary for confirming one’s evolutionary explanation. These disputes over the unit of selection’s relevant function or plurality of representation have been at the focus of the philosophical debates over group selection for several decades.
Semantic disputes notwithstanding, whether or not groups in a certain population actually show heritable variance in fitness is an empirical question (Griesemer 2000). Since Wade has already demonstrated the noticeable evolutionary effects of group selection, whether or not the population is in fact divided into social groups with heritable variance in fitness should be tested in each case, prior to describing these entities as “replicators” or “interactors,” “contextual backgrounds” or “emergent collectives.”
Brandon (1990, 98–116) reviewed the empirical criteria for a process of group selection to take place: when there is no variance in group ﬁtness or when the variance in group ﬁtness does not depend on group structure (for example, when group differential reproduction is independent of the relative frequency of altruists in the group, but instead depends on the frequency of hurricane storms in its environment), a process of selection between groups cannot occur. When both individual selection and group selection processes affect a trait, selection within groups is more effective when variance in the ﬁtness of individuals within each group exceeds variance in the mean ﬁtness between groups or when the variance in a group- trait is not heritable.
“Group trait” in this context need not be a unique holistic trait but rather can be the mean phenotype of individuals in that group; similarly, “group ﬁtness” is the mean ﬁtness of individuals within a group relative to the mean ﬁtness of another group; and “group heritability” traces phenotypic variation among parent-offspring lineages of groups: if the trait of the daughter-group signiﬁcantly resembles its mother-group compared to the population mean, then realized group heritability is non-zero. This “group trait” describes an individual’s trait within a context of a group-structured population (Heisler and Damuth, 1987); which leads Maynard Smith and Williams to argue that this is not a group trait at all or that describing this trait as an individual trait is more useful (c.f. Okasha, 2006, p. 180). Whatever the verdict on the characterization of “group trait” and “group fitness,” an empirical dimension exists, with regard to a selection process at the level of the group, and empirical criteria to test such a process are available. One might expect multiple field and laboratory tests of the existence of group selection. Natural and laboratory tests exist (Goodnight and Stevens, 1997), yet the common practice in these debates invests relatively little in empirical study. The next section will attempt to describe this practice and suggest a rational explanation for it.
One of the most revealing examples for the practice in the debates over group selection is a recent debate between Wilson, the author of Sociobiology, and Dawkins, the author of The Selfish Gene, who used to employ similar selection models but now deeply disagree over the role of group selection in the evolution of eusociality.
Both sides declare that their models are translatable (Wilson and Wilson 2007, Dawkins, 1982 p. 1), that is, can agree with any set of data the other model agrees with. If this disagreement were purely about terminology, one would expect the scientific community to gradually lose interest in it. This has not happened. Another possibility is that the models agree with all the data but differ greatly in their heuristic value. In that case, one would expect many methodological comparisons of model performance – for example, comparisons of models’ precision, generality, accuracy, complexity, and/or elegance – for various species and social phenomena in the lab and in nature. Yet these are not a central part of the debate either (Sober and Wilson, 1998). Rather, it seems there is no “given” phenomenon both sides use; instead, disputants clash on how to define or describe the phenomenon the models attempt to fit. In short, they disagree over what it is that we see when several ants walk by.
For Wilson and Wilson (2007), as in earlier work by Sober and Wilson (1989), a “group” is any aggregate of individuals that is small compared to the total population to which they belong and where individuals non-randomly interact in a way that affects each other’s fitness. This is an extremely abstract understanding of what constitutes a group: one that fits many kinds of cases and is almost completely unconstrained by any particular population structure, dynamic, duration or size. Nor does it require groups to multiply as anything like cohesive wholes in order to acquire heritable variance in fitness. Indeed, such a broad definition of “group” is central for Wilson and Wilson’s definition of “group selection:” “the evolution of traits based on the differential survival and reproduction of groups” (Wilson and Wilson, p. 329). Such a group selection model need not differ empirically from the similarly broad definition of “kin selection:” “selection affected by relatedness among individuals” (Foster et al. 2005, p.58).”Relatedness” here does not refer only to family descent but to an index of comparison between any set of individuals, including strangers, from the same species.
Similar to Wilson’s and Wilson’s “group selection,” no particular population structure constrains Foster’s et al.’s application of “kin selection.” The difference between the models lies in model structure: whereas the group selection model partitions the overall selection in the population into “within group selection” and “between groups selection” components, the alternative models – for example, kin selection, reciprocity, indirect and network reciprocity (Nowak, 2006) – do not employ such partitioning, since in these models what enhances group fitness always enhances the inclusive fitness of each individual (or rather what Dawkins “only partly facetiously” describes as “that property of an individual organism which will appear to be maximized when what is really maximized is gene survival” (Dawkins 1982, p. 187)).
This theoretical difference in model structure does not necessarily emphasize different causal factors, since the context that can affect the frequency of altruists – population structure and ecology – can be captured according to both Wilson’s and Dawkins’s models (Wilson 2008 and Foster et al. 2005), and does not constrain either model. So, argue Foster et al. (2005), if Wilson’s new group model does not generate facts unattainable otherwise, why accept his definition of “kin selection,” rather than Maynard Smith’s original 1964 definition: “the evolution of characteristics which favor the survival of close relatives of the affected individual” Dawkins, p. 1145) Yet Wilson asks in return, why not go back to Darwin’s explanation of group selection? Thus the debate again seems to be over terminology, this time with a historical twist.
But why should biologists care (as they obviously do)? If the disagreement was mainly about choosing among interchangeable perspectives for the same phenomenon, a choice based on personal taste, historical uses, or the heuristic value of each model, one would expect the scientific debate to gradually dissolve in the first two cases and become pragmatically/methodology based in the third. Since the debate has neither dissolved nor turned pragmatic, and since one can plausibly assume this debate is a rational one, the remaining explanation is the best one: that Wilson and Dawkins disagree over semantics because both hope for their different concepts and models to refer to different evolutionary processes in the world. To use Dawkins’s terms, even when modestly arguing over the flipping picture we receive from a Necker cube (Dawkins, 1982 p. 1) the non-modest aim remains to decipher the picture we see from an east-African mountain: whether the small spots below are insects or buffalos (Dawkins, p. 7).
When Wilson looks at a social group he sees a unit which is a target of selection, while Dawkins sees an illusory by-product of a different selection process, acting at a single level of organization: gene selection. They disagree the way they do because they aim toward representing empirical facts accurately, but since both sides employ overly broad definitions for “group,” “group selection” and “kin selection.” it becomes very difficult to identify a specific fact, for example, a particular population dynamic or structure, to test these models in a particular case (Shavit, 2005). In short, Wilson’s and Dawkins’s concepts might be too broad to hold enough empirical content for scientifically advancing the debate over the evolution of altruism by group selection.
Not all supporters of group selection use such broad concepts. Wade (1978, 1985) defined “group selection” and “kin selection” in accord with different population structures, so his constrained models could clearly refer to distinct selection processes that he and his colleagues then compared in the lab or in the field. Both Dawkins and Wilson may object that Wade’s definitions are too narrow. They would be right in the sense that his definitions do not cover many kinds of cases, yet that does not imply that his definitions do not cover many cases. They do (for example, Wade and Goodnight, 1998 on various taxa; Aviles, 1997 on spiders). It seems that such narrow definitions – those that restrict the kinds of cases – readily facilitate empirical tools to determine what is and is not happening in a given population, whereas the broad definitions used by Dawkins and Wilson are more likely to talk past each other without resolution. Nonetheless, the use of broad concepts seem to be dominating the field, perhaps partly due to the political images and memories that everyday terms such as “altruism,” “group” and of course “selection” carry into science from society at large (Shavit, 2008). Employing social metaphors laden with multiple conflicting meanings began with Darwin, and, ever since, explaining the evolution of altruism by group selection stubbornly remains “one special difficulty” (Darwin, 1859, p. 236).
Tel Hai Academic College
Last updated: March 27, 2010 | Originally published: