American Wilderness Philosophy

Roosevelt & Muir, by Underwood & Underwood Wilderness has been defined in diverse ways, but most famously in the Wilderness Act of 1964, which describes it “in contrast with those areas where man and his own works dominate the landscape … as an area where the earth and its community of life are untrammeled by man, where man himself is a visitor who does not remain.” The idea of wilderness has played a curious and crucial role in American culture generally, and especially in the rise of American environmentalism. Conquering wilderness was central to colonial and pioneer narratives of progress. Reverence and nostalgia for wilderness became tangled with American nationalism at the end of the 19th century, with the end of the frontier. The passage of the Wilderness Act was an historically important event in American environmental politics, which tied the fate of much of America’s public lands to disputes over the meaning of wilderness. Since then, critics both international and domestic, but mostly from within the environmental movement, have criticized the idea of wilderness. Not that preserving or protecting natural places is a bad idea, rather they argue that thinking about nature in terms of wilderness obscures important issues and leads to bad decisions.

Table of Contents

  1. Etymology
  2. Historical Attitudes
    1. Sources of Antipathy
    2. Sources of Appreciation
  3. Wilderness Preservation: Major Figures
    1. Henry David Thoreau
    2. John Muir
    3. Aldo Leopold
  4. The Wilderness Act
  5. Critical Scholarship
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Etymology

The etymology, or history of a word, is sometimes offered as though the roots revealed the word’s correct, present meaning. This is a misunderstanding, as the meaning of a word changes over time and may end up far from its original use. However, an etymology may provide important clues into the biography of an idea and may have rhetorical significance when the meaning of a word is contested. Both of these are true of the etymology of wilderness.  A rough summary of the roots of wilderness is a place essentially characterized by wild animals.  The oldest and central root in this word is wild. It is present in Common Germanic, and is found in Old English as wilde, with surviving instances from c.725 as an adjective for plants and animals that were not tamed or domesticated and applied similarly to places by c.893. The Oxford English Dictionary gives its probable origin as the pre-Germanic ghweltijos, with a possible parallel in the root of the Latin and Greek words for wild beast.

An alternate and apparently mistaken origin of wild often given in the wilderness literature, repeated in Thoreau’s journals and given by Roderick Nash for instance, is that it is the past participle of will (Nash 2014). Wilderness is understood to be self-willed land, not subjected to the will of a domesticator or cultivator. The resonance of the idea is strong, but unfortunately the Old English willian, the root of will, has no clear connection to wilde. One upshot of rejecting this interpretation is that wild is first a word for plants and animals, later applied by analogy to people, and not vice versa as Nash reports.

The next piece in the etymology is the Common Germanic word for beast, found in Old English as deor. This was combined with wilde to form wilddeor, “wild animal,” with instances known from c.825. The “(d)er” which separates wilderness from wildness, is the root of our modern word for deer. In Old English, this was combined with the suffix –en, to make the adjective wilddeoren, which became wildern in Middle English, and was used to describe places. The –en suffix generally denotes what something is made of, as in “wooden” and “earthen,” so a wildern place is one made of wilddeor, of wild beasts. To this is joined the suffix –ness in an unusually concrete sense to form wilderness..

The centrality of wild animals in the etymology is important. Wilderness points not only to the absence of human culture in the landscape but to the presence of that which is often incompatible with it. When the wolves and the bears flourish, the domestic livestock are in danger, and people fear to walk at night. And wild beasts are easily displaced by human activity and presence. Aldo Leopold calls the crane “wildness incarnate” because of its love of solitude (1949). Nash draws out this connection to animals when he interprets the etymology as “the place of wild beasts” (1970). “If wildlife is removed,” he writes, “although everything else remains visibly the same, the intensity of the sense of wilderness is diminished” (Nash 1970). He cites Thoreau’s delight in the New England Lynx, Theodore Roosevelt’s equating wilderness with big game ranges and Leopold’s discussion of the last Grizzly on Escudilla. Leopold often treats particular species as defining the character of the places they dwell.

2. Historical Attitudes

A history of conflicted attitudes towards wild places and nonhuman nature goes much further back than the roots of the word wilderness. Many languages have no equivalent word to wilderness, but still they have managed sophisticated literature on the question. Both the beauty and the inhospitality of wild nature, and humanity’s ambiguous relationship to it, are common themes going back to the very oldest preserved literature.

In telling the history of attitudes toward wild nature, there are two opposite errors of oversimplification to avoid. On the one hand, some treat the modern American and romantic elevation of wilderness as something entirely new, contrasting with previous expressions of antipathy toward wild nature. Roderick Nash (2014) leans in this direction when he says wilderness began “as the unrecognized and unnamed environmental norm for most of Earth’s history, created as a concept by civilization, thereafter widely hated and feared, and quite recently and remarkably, appreciated.” On the other hand, one might find romantic sounding passages of wilderness appreciation in diverse ancient texts, whether the Epic of Gilgamesh, the Vedas or the Psalms, and conclude that there is nothing particularly new or interesting about the American idea. The more interesting historical questions are the more nuanced considerations concerning how and why wilderness is valued or shunned across times and cultures.

a. Sources of Antipathy

While there was no universal hatred or fear of wild nature in the ancient world, at least not to the exclusion of a great deal of appreciation, there was a remarkable degree of denigration of wild nature, reaching something of a climax in early modern Europe. Romanticism was in part a reaction against this, and the ideas that lead to it, and modern wilderness appreciation and preservation took root in the soil of romanticism. The origins of that hostility are variously attributed to the Jewish and Christian scriptures, Greek and Roman philosophy, the scientific and industrial revolutions, or some combination of these.

Clear claims of anthropocentrism, of the relative worthlessness and proper subjugation of wild nature, are frequently found in ancient Greek and Roman philosophers. Here, rationality is established both as the substance of dignity and worth and as the dividing line between the human and the nonhuman (as well as marking the proper hierarchies between some humans and others). Plato, in the voice of Socrates, makes clear his limited estimation of the value of wild things in the Phaedrus (section 230d) when he writes, “I am devoted to learning; landscapes and trees have nothing to teach me—only the people in the city can do that.” Aristotle shows a much greater inclination to appreciate and study wild nature, but he makes clear its subjugation and secondary value: nature making nothing in vain means that it all must exist for the sake of man (Politics 1256b7-22). Chrysippus agrees, finding it absurd to think that the world could have been made for the plants, or the irrational animals (cited in Coates 1998). The Roman philosopher Lucretius describes the presence of forests, mountains and wild beasts on the earth as a serious defect, taking heart that “these regions it is generally in our power to shun” (cited in Nash 2014). This is not to say that there were no elements of appreciation for wild nature in Greek or Roman society or letters, for that is not the case. But there was a clearly articulated and enduring view which implied wild nature was essentially wasted space.

Many commentators, including Nash, have followed Lynn White’s lead in pointing to theism and the Jewish and Christian scriptures as the source of antipathy toward wild nature (White 1967). These scriptures had a formative influence on modern attitudes toward wilderness because of the prominent use of the word in English translations of the Bible. Spiritual connotations, especially from the Exodus account of the Israelites wandering in the wilderness for forty years, were laid onto the word, as well as new physical associations with arid and desert landscapes. The meaning of these spiritual connotations is complex, as wilderness is at once a place of divine revelation as well as temptation and punishment. The Bible does not clearly convey an overarching attitude of fear or hatred of the wild. Genesis 1 repeatedly declares the goodness of everything, prior to the creation of humans. The Psalms celebrate both the useless parts of nature, such as rock badgers, as well as the dangerous, such as lions, as independently glorifying to God (Psalm 104).  Animals, both wild and domestic, plants and even soil are given protections in the Mosaic Law (for example, Exodus 23:10-11; Deuteronomy 20:19-20, 22:6, 25:4), and God is described as making covenant with the Earth and all its creatures (Genesis 9). Even the often cited passage giving people dominion over the other animals, does not clearly put them at human disposal, for it manifestly did not include permission to eat animals (Genesis 1:28-29; Genesis 9:3).

As Greco-Roman philosophy and Christian theology increasingly joined together in medieval and modern European intellectual culture, the ideas of Plato and Aristotle were given new expression in biblical and theological language. Rationality is privileged by Aquinas in this combined way, for instance, arguing that only the rational creatures can know and love God and thereby fulfill the purpose of creation (Summa Contra Gentiles c.1270).  The enlightenment and scientific revolution included a great revival of interest in Greek and Roman philosophy, and serious interest in nature was focused onto the search for universal, mathematical laws. Francis Bacon’s writings in the early 17th century established a lasting connection between the idea of dominion in Genesis and the project of scientific-technological mastery over nature. The metaphor of nature as machine came to dominate. Descartes argued that, lacking rationality, non-human animals should not be supposed to have souls or consciousness at all, but are mere automata, to be freely experimented upon (Discourse on Method 1637). As the scientific project bore fruit in the industrial revolution, the dominant view of wild nature was as disordered material which could be brought into rational order through science and labor, and thus serve its ultimate purpose of existing for the benefit of mankind. This view is clearly expressed in John Locke’s influential labor-theory of property, which justifies the human worker’s property rights over nature on the basis of nature having little to no value before the worker’s labor was mixed with it (Second Treatise on Government 1689).

The Lockean attitude toward wilderness as waste is clearly evident among the early American colonists. For instance, the Puritan John Winthrop gave as a reason for going to America that it would be wrong to let a whole continent lie waste (Nash 2014). Justification for displacing indigenous people was often asserted on the basis that they had not worked it, or at least not rationally. And the attitude continued to dominate well into the settlement of the west. Alexis de Tocqueville complained upon visiting America in the 1830s that Americans could only see their wilderness as an obstacle to progress (cited in Nash 2014). During the time of the exploration, colonization and settlement of the North America by the Europeans, the idea that the less rational parts of nature existed for the sake of the more rational was thoroughly entrenched. And wilderness especially had to be transformed by labor to fulfill that purpose.

b. Sources of Appreciation

The scientific revolution also produced a contrary attitude towards nonhuman nature, however, best expressed in a group known as the physic-theologians. Writers such as John Ray (1627-1705) found in wild nature, not the absence of rationality, but the rational design of God, worthy of study and contemplation. Indeed, studying wild nature was thought to be an especially important path to understanding God, since only wild nature was unaffected by the fall and sin of mankind. Physico-theology contributed to the rise and influence of natural history, an approach to science that in turn deeply informed the wilderness preservation movement.

The practice of natural history flourished in America in the 18th and 19th centuries and was characterized by the description, collection and classification of natural specimens and objects. The fondness of European aristocrats and intellectuals for natural curiosities from around the world made natural history a singular way for colonists to stay connected to the social and intellectual affairs of Europe. The travel and work of natural historians was thus often tangled with the broader European projects of exploration and conquest, and the naturalists, who frequently found themselves caring for what was being destroyed, often expressed significant concern about this connection. Natural historians were largely generalists, writing about nature as a comprehensive whole, and often organized in local, amateur, natural history societies (Smallwood 1967). Some like Alexander von Humboldt, were well connected members of European society who travelled over much of the world, while others like John and William Bartram and John James Audubon were from the colonies and travelled only regionally. Artistic and literary abilities were crucial for their success, and the travel narratives of naturalists became a popular literary genre, where some of the earliest and strongest positive evaluations of wild nature found their greatest audiences.

Romanticism, a multifaceted cultural trend and backlash against the scientific and industrial revolutions, brought not just an acceptance but an enthusiastic veneration of wild nature and wilderness to cultural prominence. Romanticism had strong connections to the natural history tradition: William Wordsworth and Samuel Coleridge were readers of William Bartram (Smallwood 1967), and Alexander von Humboldt was closely associated with Goethe. But romanticism’s influence on wilderness appreciation comprised much more than its further endorsement of natural history as a significant mode of science. Romanticism treated aesthetic responses to nature as just as important as nature’s quantifiable properties, and developed a robust conception of the sublime. Romantic trends in literature and painting, especially the Hudson River school, produced many powerful, positive portrayals of wilderness. Suspecting that modern industrial society corrupts people rather than cultivates them, romanticism also endorsed primitivism and the pursuit of frequent solitude in nature.

Another aspect of romanticism that was important for the rise of wilderness preservation, was its emphasis on nationalism. America’s great wilderness became a point of pride and national identity, something that set it apart from Europe. The historian Frederick Jackson Turner argued that several aspects of the American character, from self-reliance to a democratic spirit, were products of the American frontier experience (1921). And he worried that the continuation of the American national distinctiveness was jeopardized by the end of the frontier, which was formally declared in the 1890 census. Frontier nostalgia drove a lot of early preservation work, as well as related phenomena, particularly the scouting movement and recreational hunting.

America also saw the development of a distinctive form of the romantic movement known as American transcendentalism. Ralph Waldo Emerson’s Nature, a seminal text for transcendentalism, explores the importance of solitude, the beauty of nature and the significance for both of these for understanding God. Emerson’s influence on Henry David Thoreau, and his long relationship with him, plants the roots of the American wilderness preservation movement firmly in transcendentalism. For Thoreau is the first major figure and intellectual of the wilderness tradition.

Another important factor in in the growing appreciation of wilderness was America’s early experience with extensive deforestation. Among the many who bemoaned this loss, none articulated the problem for the public more clearly and effectively than George Perkins Marsh. His 1864 Man and Nature first clearly indicted deforestation for its effects on soil and water. Marsh refuted the naïve optimism of the day, concerning the beneficial effects of all human labor on nature, and outlined rather the devastating, unintended harms caused by inappropriate uses of land. The economically practical case he provided for the conservation of forests and general care for the land provided an important complement to the aesthetic and spiritual emphasis of the romantics.

3. Wilderness Preservation: Major Figures

Expressions of wilderness appreciation multiplied quickly in the late 19th and early 20th century, and many people made distinctive contributions in art, literature, science and policy. A few major figures, however, laid out distinctive visions which guided the course of wilderness preservation, and which contemporary scholars tend to treat as the defining core of the tradition.

a. Henry David Thoreau

Thoreau’s work develops many of the romantic themes towards nature. Especially in Walden, he is concerned with the degrading influence of too much society, commerce and industry and with the salutary effects of nature’s company. He was a frequent canoe traveler and mountaineer, and developed a daily habit of extensive hiking. Both Walden and his travel writings argue for the existence of deeper meanings and higher uses in nature than as mere material for the human economy. He found the aesthetic value of nature to be spiritually and morally important, and woefully underappreciated. But he also spoke of a broader point view, which sees the weeds as food for the birds and the squirrels as planters of the forest. Recognizing that nature, often in the very places it is widely despised, has hidden and indirect values, he anticipates the contemporary economic idea of ecosystem services.

After his stay at Walden Pond, Thoreau turned his energies increasingly to natural history, particularly in the mode of Humboldt. He expressed some concern about the possibility of a purely scientific disenchanting nature and dulling of the imagination. But he was committed to cultivating the greatest awareness of nature as possible and to fully appreciating the value of facts, refusing to reduce appearances to the merely symbolic as Emerson had tended to. He kept careful records of plant and animal distribution and phenology, which have proven valuable for current climate science, and made seminal contributions to the understanding of forest succession and seed distribution. Unfortunately Thoreau’s early death left many of these projects unfinished and unpublished, although most are now available. His extensive journals, influential works in their own right, show a rich blending of this careful attention to natural history with the poetic and philosophical insight.

The essay Walking, revised and reworked until the end of his life, is particularly significant for wilderness thought. In this essay he treats wildness as the highest ideal of ethics and aesthetics and defends the view that both land and people need a balance of the cultivated and the wild, albeit sharply tilted toward the wild. In this work appears his oft-quoted dictum that “In wildness is the preservation of the world.” Max Oelschlaeger points to Thoreau’s lament for pine trees reduced to mere lumber as the earliest and clearest statement of a preservationist’s credo: “Every creature is better alive than dead, men and moose and pine trees, and he who understands it aright will rather preserve its life than destroy it” (cited in Oelschlaeger 1991). Other late works, such as Huckleberries, progress from his early radical valuations of nature to clear preservationist policy arguments for parks, greenways and protected areas.

Considered a minor figure at first, then highly esteemed in American literature and political thought, Thoreau’s philosophical contributions—not only to environmental philosophy but also epistemology, philosophy of science and ethics—received increasing attention in the early 21st century.

b. John Muir

The Muir family emigrated from Scotland when Muir was a young boy, as his father sought the opportunity to live his Campbellite faith more authentically. Muir’s childhood was saturated with an evangelical Biblicism and the poetry of Robert Burns, the Scottish romantic. His experience as a frontier farmer was largely negative, as he was sorely abused by his father for hard labor. Thanks in part to his genius for mechanics and invention, he found his way to the University of Wisconsin in Madison where he found an enthusiasm for botany. He also encountered transcendentalism and a romantic, nature-centered spirituality, which at first supplemented and then gradually transformed his evangelical faith. There is substantial debate on if and when he might be considered a pantheist. What is clear is that Muir’s wilderness philosophy is often expressed in much more intensely religious language than Thoreau’s, and is frequently wrapped in biblical metaphor.

Frequently a solitary traveler in the wilderness himself, he often focused on the potential of wilderness and of nature study for personal and spiritual transformation. His prescription for overworked and materialistic America was a conversion, a baptism in mountain beauty and reconciliation to wild nature. Muir found nature to be not only sublime and beautiful but earnestly benevolent. Even what appears harsh and destructive in nature, such as glaciation (a process on which he became a significant expert), should be seen as part of the ongoing, loving, creative process. Like Thoreau, Muir found tame and domestic plants and animals to be generally degraded versions of their wild counterparts, and he sometimes spoke in terms of the rights of nonhuman nature.

Muir’s increasing political significance grew out of his personal involvement with Yosemite, and its gradual progress toward becoming a national park. He became convinced that federal ownership was the only way that such exceptional places could be preserved from destruction. While God had preserved California’s giant trees through the ages, he wrote, only Uncle Sam could protect them from fools (1901). His eloquent writing on behalf of national parks and preservation made him a figurehead for the movement, a role which was formalized with the formation of the Sierra Club with him as charter president.

Early in the 20th century, the movement for conservation on public lands began to fracture. Muir came to represent one end of a spectrum on how much and what sort of economic uses should be present in the federal reserves. Muir’s emphasis on the spiritual and aesthetic values of wilderness clashed with the progressive, utilitarian vision of Gifford Pinchot, who was more concerned that the nation’s resources should be developed efficiently for the public good, protected from shortsighted exploitation for private enrichment. The proposed and eventual damming of Hetch Hetchy Valley, within Yosemite National Park, for municipal water and power, brought this tension to bitter conflict during Muir’s later years. Muir was not opposed to productive work in nature, nor the human transformation of it in many places. He spent many profitable years working in sawmills and later managing a vineyard. But beauty, he held, is as much a need as bread or water is, and our physical needs can be met without destroying our most beautiful scenery. Just as timber can be had without cutting the redwoods, water could be had without flooding a national park. Muir saw the problem as one of greed for profit unconstrained by higher sensibilities.

c. Aldo Leopold

Aldo Leopold made significant contributions to both wilderness philosophy and policy. An avid naturalist and outdoorsman, Leopold worked within the new forest service to enhance recreation and hunting opportunities. He developed and established the scientific practice of game management. He was constant in his advocacy of a thoughtful and informed stewardship of nature, but his early confidence in the possibility and value of scientific manipulation the land for increased timber and game production was heavily tempered in his mature work.

Leopold’s major policy contribution was to push for a separate classification of land within the national forests, to be kept as roadless wilderness—a clear precursor to the Wilderness Act. Leopold, and those who followed his lead, such as Bob Marshall and the other founders of the Wilderness Society, were responding to the rise of the automobile, which Muir had not so much appreciated as a threat to wilderness. Touring and camping by automobile was growing rapidly, and the parks and forest recreation areas were filling with the roads and hotels to accommodate them. Leopold sought to protect some areas from this sort of development, first for those who wished to pursue more primitive types of recreation, including travel by canoe and pack train, and seekers of solitude, and then later for the protection of land and wildlife.

Philosophically, Leopold integrated wilderness appreciation with the maturing science of ecology, developed new arguments for preserving wilderness and articulated a moral vision for human relations to nonhuman nature, which he called the land ethic. From ecology, Leopold took a much more detailed picture of the land as an interdependent system of plants, animals, soils and natural processes—a biotic community. Understanding the land as a functionally integrated entity means that the land can be healthy or sick, analogously to an organism. Nutrients can be retained in cycles or lost; soils can be accumulated or depleted; species can persist or become extinct. Only healthy land has the capacity to replenish itself when disturbed. And since the workings of the land mechanism are beyond a full human understanding, an attitude of caution is warranted. Removing predators (the standard practice when he began his forestry career) could lead to disastrous consequences for soils and plants, a lesson he learned from personal experience.

Leopold developed the recreation argument for wilderness along several lines. Against charges of elitism, that big wilderness served the small minority with the strength and leisure time for it, he held that minority interests are worthy of protection. There is no danger of insufficient places for the more popular auto tourism, and public lands should not all be devoted to one kind of recreation. Camping and woodcraft are not only an idle nostalgia for our frontier past, they are a moral improvement upon it, directing old instincts to higher ends. He likened this change to the way football is an improvement over war; the transformation to sport preserved the best parts of the older practice without the downsides.

In later works, Leopold increasingly emphasized the value of wilderness for science. Wilderness is not the only healthy land, some traditional agricultural landscapes have showed long-term resilience, but it provides crucial examples of biotic communities that have functioned well over long time spans. Ecologists need wilderness the way doctors need healthy bodies to study. His own restoration of a worn-out farm demonstrated the practical value of this kind of ecological knowledge. Wilderness is also an important refuge for preserving wildlife, especially the large predators generally eliminated in other places. The arguments from science and wildlife are not entirely separate from the recreation argument, as Leopold suggests that wildlife study is one of the greatest forms of outdoor recreation.

The land ethic grew out of Leopold’s conviction that only a change in our ethical attitude toward the land could prevent us from spoiling it. Such a change he thought was not only possible but underway. The care people naturally feel toward their community and their neighbor can be extended to the land, for ecology clearly shows that the land is a community to which we belong. The recognition that we are plain members and citizens of that community supports the restraint and forbearance that is necessary to live in harmony with the land. Preserving the “integrity, stability and beauty of the biotic community” should limit our use of the land, as surely as economic feasibility does.

Leopold’s land ethic has been heralded as the first ecocentric ethic, an approach finally adequate to our environmental problems. It has also been criticized as offering a fascist justification for overriding individual rights in the interest of the community (Tom Regan, cited in Callicott 1987). Its lineage has also been debated: whether it is based on Darwin’s use of Hume’s ethics (Callicott 1987), or if it has more in common with the pragmatism Leopold would have encountered at Yale (Norton 1988). Either way, Leopold’s respect for the biotic community and his vision of wilderness as an important use within federal lands profoundly shaped the future of environmental thought and the coming Wilderness Act.

4. The Wilderness Act

The National Wilderness Preservation System was created with the passage of the Wilderness Act in 1964. The Act did not create a separate agency, but designated and protected roadless areas within federal lands, whether managed by the Forest Service, National Park Service, Fish and Wildlife Service or the Bureau of Land Management. The Act provides for substantial public input on proposed listings and requires congressional action for land to be added or removed from the system. Similar to national parks, wilderness areas are required to be managed under a twin mandate, kept both for the “use and enjoyment” of the people and preserving their wilderness character unimpaired.

The Wilderness Act includes a poetic definition of wilderness, which has been the subject of much critical discussion:

A wilderness, in contrast with those areas where man and his own works dominate the landscape, is hereby recognized as an area where the earth and its community of life are untrammeled by man, where man himself is a visitor who does not remain. An area of wilderness is further defined to mean in this Act an area of undeveloped Federal land retaining its primeval character and influence, without permanent improvements or human habitation, which is protected and managed so as to preserve its natural conditions and which (1) generally appears to have been affected primarily by the forces of nature, with the imprint of man's work substantially unnoticeable; (2) has outstanding opportunities for solitude or a primitive and unconfined type of recreation; (3) has at least five thousand acres of land or is of sufficient size as to make practicable its preservation and use in an unimpaired condition; and (4) may also contain ecological, geological, or other features of scientific, educational, scenic, or historical value.

Some of the definition’s notable features are the emphasis on the absence of human presence and impact, the language of degree and subjective appearance and the unusual word, “untrammeled.” Trammel is not a form of trample, and does not involve the idea of walking. It means to bind up, constrain or fetter, not simply touch or influence. Trammel can also be a noun, referring to a kind of fish net or to rope shackles tied on a horse’s legs to keep it from galloping.

Implementation of the Wilderness Act required some interpretive decisions. The Forest Service, generally seeking to maintain more flexible control over its lands, argued for a strict interpretation of wilderness, excluding any lands with a significant history of human impact. This came to be known as the purity policy. Others, including the Wilderness Society, the non-profit organization which had first pushed for the law and shepherded it through the years of debate before it finally passed, argued for a more flexible and pragmatic understanding of wilderness (Turner 2012). Rather than looking back at whether the land had suffered human impact, the question was whether it could be managed in a way that would render human impact substantially unnoticeable in the future (Woods 1998).

At stake in this question was both how big the wilderness system could be and whether there would be more than a few wilderness areas east of the Mississippi, where historic impacts were generally greater. The forward-looking approach championed by the Wilderness Society eventually triumphed with the 1975 designation of many eastern areas with significant past impacts, which has come to be called the Eastern Wilderness Act.

Another issue that came into the question of purity was how much wilderness should be protected from recreational overuse. Frontier nostalgia tended to a form of recreational woodcraft that was fairly high impact, with campers cutting boughs for beds and lean-tos, for instance. As outdoor recreation continued to increase in popularity through the 1960s and 70s, there was debate over whether wilderness and lands for recreation ought to be given separate designations, which would have resulted in far less wilderness areas. The dilemma was mitigated with a movement toward low-impact camping, culminating in the Leave No Trace program (Turner 2002). While vastly increasing the number of people who can camp in a wilderness area without spoiling it, the new methods have also introduced a greater dependence on consumer products and synthetic materials and reduced the need for knowledge of the natural history of the place.

Another test for the meaning of federal wilderness areas would come with the debates over public lands in Alaska, where vast roadless areas often contained indigenous peoples practicing subsistence lifestyles. In 1980, the Alaska National Interest Lands Conservation Act added 56 million acres to the National Wilderness Preservation System, more than doubling its size, but permitting many activities crucial to subsistence living not permitted in designated wilderness outside Alaska. Some motorized access and even log cabins, it was decided, do not pose the same threat to the “Earth and its community of life” in Alaska as they would in the more densely populated U.S. states.

5. Critical Scholarship

Wilderness preservation has often faced criticism and opposition in the political arena. The Sagebrush Rebellion was largely a reaction against the implementation of the Wilderness Act on western lands. Such conflict is often rooted in issues of public versus private property rights. The academic literature on wilderness has tended to focus on other issues—the history of the idea, its influence on policy, and whether it represents a reasonable or appropriate approach to nonhuman nature.

Roderick Nash’s 1967 book, Wilderness and the American Mind, was the seminal work for contemporary wilderness scholarship. It traced the history of the idea of wilderness from ancient attitudes toward nature through the passage of the Wilderness Act. Nash frames the story as the remarkable rise of appreciation for wilderness from the midst of long-standing antipathy. Though not without offering some criticism, the work is largely celebratory of the wilderness tradition and preservation movement and has had an enduring popularity with the backpackers and activists as well as a lasting influence on scholarship. Much of the wilderness scholarship subsequent to Nash’s work has essentially aimed to supplement or correct the general picture given in it.

The first in a series of criticisms and responses, that came to be known as the great new wilderness debate, came from Ramachandra Guha, an environmental and political historian from India (1989). Guha argued that the radical environmental movement in America had an unhealthy focus on biocentrism and wilderness, which are largely irrelevant to the problems he claims are at the root of the environmental crisis: overconsumption and militarization. Environmentalism in India has largely been a class struggle between the rural poor, who depend on the forests for their subsistence, and the over-consuming urban industrialists, which threaten to destroy the forests and poor alike. Western environmental organizations coming into India and working to establish wilderness-like reserves, such as the tiger reserves, are further displacing traditional subsistence economies to make playgrounds for the wealthy. Wilderness, according to Guha, was not appropriate in densely and long inhabited places like India.

William Cronon, an environmental historian, and J. Baird Callicott, an environmental philosopher, followed with arguments that there was something more deeply flawed about the idea of wilderness, even in North America (Cronon 1995; Callicott 1991). Unlike Guha, both insisted that they support protected areas; their problem was with a way of thinking. Wilderness is historically false, denying the long and extensive human influences on the North American landscape, and thus continuing the denial of the humanity of Native Americans. Wilderness thinking presupposes a pre-Darwinian dichotomy between people and nature by treating only people-less places as real or pristine nature. The result of this dualism is misanthropy and a tendency to see the removal of people as the solution to every environmental problem. Holding wilderness to be the ideal form of nature, they argued, is an obstacle to a responsible environmentalism, which must help us live in harmony with nature in the places we inhabit and work not just the places we visit and play in. Cronon in particular worried that caring for pristine nature far from home makes it easier to tolerate the abuse and destruction of mundane nature close to home. Wilderness thinking, they alleged, also tends to treat nature as static, seeking to preserve a place in a particular form, instead of recognizing the dynamic processes at play in nature.

More critics soon followed, drawing out the imperialism, colonialism or ethnocentrism latent in the preservation project. Many of the criticisms were clearly grounded. Frontier nostalgia requires a certain blindness to the perspectives of Native Americans, and western style parks have been implemented in Africa in ways that are brutal to the indigenous inhabitants. But many wilderness advocates found the criticisms to be unfair overall and not helpful to achieving the responsible environmentalism the critics claimed to desire. The Wilderness Act had not endorsed an ideal of pristine or untouched nature, and the Forest Service’s attempt to interpret it that way had been roundly defeated (Friskics 2008). And the experience in Alaska had showed that wilderness preservation need not be hostile to indigenous people or traditional subsistence cultures. It is not that the environmental movement in America has only sought wilderness preservation and not worked for reform in forestry, agriculture and industry; it is just that reform efforts have often been less successful and harder to accomplish than wilderness designation (Foreman 1998).

Val Plumwood gives a thorough analysis of the issue of dualism in the wilderness tradition, finding it in the frequent appellation, “virgin,” and the legal doctrine of terra nullius in the Australian outback (1998). But she also demonstrated how much of the tradition is open to a non-dualistic interpretation, treating the other of wilderness not as the mere absence of the human but as the presence of something else. The extensive concern with natural history in all the major figures of the wilderness tradition strongly supports this non-dualistic interpretation of wilderness as presence. And if wilderness is not simply the absence of human touch, then valuing and preserving it need not lead to misanthropy. People visiting but not remaining is not the essence of wilderness but a practical strategy for protecting what is essential to wilderness: the living, active presence of nonhuman nature, whether it be grizzly bears or giant trees.

Other responses have come from the new conservationists, a diverse alliance of wilderness activists and conservation biologists, which have pushed for a much more aggressive preservation strategy in the 90s and 2000s. The Wildlands Project, for example, proposed a map of wilderness areas, buffer zones and wildlife corridors that puts 50% of the contiguous US into some form of protected status. James Turner suggests that this more aggressive strategy precipitated the great new wilderness debate (2012). But the new conservationists, such as Reed Noss and Dave Foreman, are clear that their sense of wilderness is largely about securing the wildlife habitat necessary to mitigate the extinction crisis (Foreman 1995, 1998 and Noss 1991). Rather than looking for lands supposedly never touched by people, they seek to restore much land that is presently heavily trammeled and dominated by the works of man. And rather than seeing nature as static, their pursuit of bigger and bigger wilderness areas is driven by an increased understanding of landscape dynamics and of the population sizes needed for evolution to occur.

The legacy of wilderness in America thought and policy is complex, with some parts that have many opponents (for example, the erasure of indigenous cultures and histories) and some that have very wide appeal (for example, the national parks). The writings of Thoreau, Muir and Leopold have enriched and enchanted the lives of many Americans. The National Wilderness Preservation System has been remarkably successful at preserving large roadless areas, and many conservation biologists see an extension of this strategy as the best hope for protecting biodiversity. Others have found the cultural baggage of wilderness too great, and would prefer to take other strategies, hoping to better integrate the human economy with natural systems. Clearly wilderness preservation cannot solve all environmental problems, such as environmental injustice or climate change, but it may help with a lot of problems, even those.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Abbey, Edward. Desert Solitaire: A Season in the Wilderness. (New York: McGraw Hill, 1968).
    • An influential articulation of a wilderness philosophy, this book was written after the Wilderness Act but early in the process of review and designation. It is deeply imbued with an appreciation of the desert southwest.
  • Bartram, William. Travels and Other Writings. Thomas P. Slaughter, ed. (New York: Library of America, 1996).
  • Bartram’s Travels, first published in 1791.
    • His major literary work, representing natural history in a romantic mode and a literary genre of significant importance for the growing wilderness appreciation.
  • Bugbee, Henry. The Inward Morning: A Philosophical Exploration in Journal Form (Athens, Ga: University of Georgia Press, 1999). First published in 1958.
    • A remarkable and beautiful use of wilderness for understanding reality and our place in it. Deep Thoreauvian reflections in dialogue with mid-20th century philosophy.
  • Callicott, J. Baird. “The Conceptual Foundations of the Land Ethic.” Companion to A Sand County Almanac: Interpretive and Critical Essays. J. Baird Callicott, ed. (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1987): 186-217.
  • Callicott, J. Baird. “The Wilderness Idea Revisited: The Sustainable Development Alternative” The Environmental Professional 13 (1991): 235-47. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Callicott, J. Baird and Michael Nelson, eds. The Great New Wilderness Debate (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998).
    • A comprehensive collection of contemporary wilderness criticism, including a selection of important works from across the history of the wilderness tradition.  It also includes several significant original pieces.
  • Callicott, J. Baird and Michael Nelson, eds. The Wilderness Debate Rages On: Continuing the Great New Wilderness Debate (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 2008).
    • A second large collection, this volume includes a lot of the critical scholarship on wilderness published since the first collection. It also covers some gaps in the previous volume, including important works by early 20th century ecologists and more discussion of race and class.
  • Chipeniuk, Raymond. “The Old and Middle English Origins of ‘Wilderness.’” Environments 21(1991): 22-28.
  • Coates, Peter. Nature: Western Attitudes since Ancient Times (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1998).
    • This book is especially helpful on Roman and Medieval times, often skipped over in other treatments, and it balances the history of ideas with the history of the environment, considering ancient impacts in some depth.
  • Cole, David N. and Laurie Yung, eds. Beyond Naturalness: Rethinking Park and Wilderness Stewardship in an Era of Rapid Change. 2nd ed. (Washington, D.C.: Island Press, 2010).
    • Diverse approaches to interpreting naturalness and wildness are considered in light of the practical management of protected areas and the challenges currently facing such management, including climate change and invasive species.
  • Cronon, William, ed. Uncommon Ground: Rethinking the Human Place in Nature. (New York: W. W. Norton & Company, 1995).
    • This anthology is largely critical of the idea of wilderness and includes Cronon’s much discussed piece, “The Trouble with Wilderness, or, Getting Back to the Wrong Nature.” It includes several other worthwhile chapters as well, particularly Anne Spirn’s chapter on the legacy of Frederick Law Olmsted.
  • Emerson, Ralph Waldo. Nature (Boston: James Munroe & Company, 1836).
    • Emerson’s classic is widely available in print and on the internet, including a scanned image of the 1836 original.
  • Friskics, Scott. “The Twofold Myth of Pristine Wilderness: Misreading the Wilderness Act in Terms of Purity” Environmental Ethics 30 (2008): 381-99.
  • Foreman, Dave. “Wilderness Areas for Real.” The Great New Wilderness Debate.. J. Baird Callicott and Michael Nelson, eds. (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998): 395-407.
  • Foreman, Dave. “Wilderness: From Scenery to Nature” Wild Earth 5(4) (Winter 1995/96): 9-16. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Guha, Ramachandra. “Radical American Environmentalism and Wilderness Preservation: A Third World Critique.” Environmental Ethics 11 (1989): 71-83. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Harding, Walter. The Days of Henry Thoreau: A Biography. 2nd ed. (Mineola, NY: Dover Publications, 2011).
    • First published by Knopf in 1965, this biography has seen many printings. See also Richardson, 1988.
  • Hargrove, Eugene C. Foundations of Environmental Ethics (Denton: Environmental Ethics Books, 1996).
    • First published in 1989, this work is valuable for its discussion of the history of property rights and their tension with preservation. It also defends the viability of aesthetic arguments for preservation and their connection to wildlife conservation.
  • Harvey, Mark. Wilderness Forever: Howard Zhaniser and the Path to the Wilderness Act (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2005).
    • Zhaniser was the primary author of the Wilderness Act and a driving force behind its eventual passage.
  • Leopold, Aldo. A Sand County Almanac and Sketches Here and There. Special Commemorative Edition (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1987). First published in 1949.
    • Aldo Leopold’s most influential work, accepted for publication just before his death. The last section of the book, called the “Upshot,” contains the most direct discussion of wilderness and the land ethic.
  • Leopold, Aldo. The River of the Mother of God and Other Essays. Susan L. Flader and J. Baird Callicott, eds. (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1991).
    • Many of Leopold’s other works, arranged chronologically, enabling the reader to see the development of his thought over time.
  • Lewis, Michael. American Wilderness: A New History (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).
    • An anthology covering diverse aspects of the history of wilderness and preservation in America, updating and complementing Nash’s work in several ways. For instance, it includes a chapter chronicling the extensive role of women and women’s clubs in the early preservation movement.
  • Lowenthal, David. George Perkins Marsh: Prophet of Conservation (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2000).
    • A scholarly biography situating Marsh’s life and work in relation to the early conservation movement.
  • Marsh, George Perkins. Man and Nature; or, Physical Geography as Modified by Human Action (New York: Charles Scribner, 1864).
    • Immensely influential on the beginnings of the conservation movement, this work by Marsh first clearly established that human labor in nature is often more destructive than helpful. He focuses on the role of forests and deforestation on the condition of waters and soils and on the possibility of people working to heal or restore damaged land.
  • Meine, Curt D. Aldo Leopold: His Life and Work (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press: 1988).
    • This is the foremost biography of Leopold. The 2010 edition has a new preface and a contribution from Wendell Berry.
  • Muir, John. Our National Parks. (Boston: Houghton, Mifflin & Company, 1901).
  • Muir, John. Nature Writings. William Cronon, ed. (New York: Library of America, 1997.)
    • Most of Muir’s writings were published first as magazine articles, and later collected into books. This collection contains many of the most influential pieces.
  • Nash, Roderick Frazier. Wilderness and the American Mind. 5th ed. (New Haven: Yale, 2014)
    • First published in 1967, this work was path breaking scholarship and has had enduring popularity with wilderness enthusiasts and activists. Several chapters have been added in subsequent additions, and the 5th edition includes a forward by Char Miller.
  • Nash, Roderick Frazier. “‘Wild-d­ēor-ness,’ The Place of Wild Beasts.” Wilderness: the Edge of Knowledge. Maxine E. McCloskey, ed. (San Francisco: Sierra Club, 1970):  34-37.
  • Norton, Bryan G. “The Constancy of Leopold’s Land Ethic.” Conservation Biology 2(1) (1988): 93-102.
  • Noss, Reed. “Wilderness Recovery: Thinking Big in Restoration Ecology.” The Environmental Professional 13 (1991): 225-34. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Oelschlaeger, Max. The Idea of Wilderness (New Haven: Yale, 1991).
    • Extensive treatment of the major figures of the wilderness tradition. Includes a notable chapter on the poets Robinson Jeffers and Gary Snyder.
  • Plumwood, Val. “Wilderness Skepticism and Wilderness Dualism.” The Great New Wilderness Debate. J. Baird Callicott and Michael Nelson, eds. (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998): 652-690.
  • Richardson, Robert. Henry Thoreau: A Life of the Mind (Oakland: University of California Press, 1988).
    • This biography focuses on the intellectual development of Thoreau, with critical discussion of his written work.
  • Sachs, Aaron. The Humboldt Current: Nineteenth-Century Exploration and the Roots of American Environmentalism (New York: Viking, 2006.)
    • Sachs provides an in depth discussion of the influence of romantic natural history, especially in the person of Alexander von Humboldt, on American culture and attitudes toward nature.
  • Smallwood, William Martin. Natural History and the American Mind (New York: AMS Press, 1967).
    • Chronicles the development of natural history and its cultural importance in the American colonies and the young republic.
  • Spence, Mark David. Dispossessing the Wilderness: Indian Removal and the Making of the National Parks (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
  • Sutter, Paul. Driven Wild: How the Fight Against Automobiles Launched the Modern Wilderness Movement (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2002).
  • Thoreau, Henry David. The Journal of Henry D. Thoreau. 14 volumes. B. Torrey and F. Allen, eds. (New York: Dover, 1962). Originally published in 1906.
  • Thoreau, Henry David. Walden: A Fully Annotated Edition. Jeffrey S. Cramer, ed. (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004).
  • Thoreau, Henry David. Essays: A Fully Annotated Edition. Jeffrey S. Cramer, ed. (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2013).
    • This volume contains “Walking” and his most important wilderness travel and natural history writings.
  • Turner, Frederick Jackson. The Frontier in American History (New York: Henry Holt & Company, 1921).
    • Turner’s “frontier thesis” was originally given as an address in 1893, just after the census declared the end of the frontier. The idea gave fervor to the growing frontier nostalgia, and its accuracy as history has been long debated.
  • Turner, Jack. The Abstract Wild. (Tucson: University of Arizona Press, 1996).
    • A manifesto and sustained argument against, among other things, the sufficiency of managed parks for the preservation of wildness.
  • Turner, James Morton. “From Woodcraft to ‘Leave No Trace’: Wilderness, Consumerism, and Environmentalism in Twentieth-Century America” Environmental History 7(3) (2002): 462-84. Reprinted in The Wilderness Debate Rages On.
  • Turner, James Morton. The Promise of Wilderness: American Environmental Politics since 1964 (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2012).
    • This work picks up the history where Nash’s book left off, successfully putting to rest any notion that public lands preservation has been less important to environmentalism since the 60s. This is the best source on the way different agencies and organizations have interpreted wilderness in applying the legal designation.
  • White, Lynn, Jr. “The Historical Roots of Our Ecological Crisis.” Science 155 (1967): 1203-07.
  • Woods, Mark. “Federal Wilderness Preservation in the United States: The Preservation of Wilderness?” The Great New Wilderness Debate. J. Baird Callicott and Michael Nelson, eds. (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998): 131-153.
  • Worster, Donald. A Passion for Nature: The Life of John Muir (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008).
    • An extensive biography of Muir by one of the foremost environmental historians.
  • Worster, Donald. Nature’s Economy: A History of Ecological Ideas. 2nd ed. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994).
    • This is an important treatment of the romantic natural history tradition and its legacy in general, and of Thoreau in particular.


Author Information

David Henderson
Western Carolina University
U. S. A.