Although there is no consensus about the exact span of time that corresponds to the American Enlightenment, it is safe to say that it occurred during the eighteenth century among thinkers in British North America and the early United States and was inspired by the ideas of the British and French Enlightenments. Based on the metaphor of bringing light to the Dark Age, the Age of the Enlightenment (Siècle des lumières in French and Aufklärung in German) shifted allegiances away from absolute authority, whether religious or political, to more skeptical and optimistic attitudes about human nature, religion and politics. In the American context, thinkers such as Thomas Paine, James Madison, Thomas Jefferson, John Adams and Benjamin Franklin invented and adopted revolutionary ideas about scientific rationality, religious toleration and experimental political organization—ideas that would have far-reaching effects on the development of the fledgling nation. Some coupled science and religion in the notion of deism; others asserted the natural rights of man in the anti-authoritarian doctrine of liberalism; and still others touted the importance of cultivating virtue, enlightened leadership and community in early forms of republican thinking. At least six ideas came to punctuate American Enlightenment thinking: deism, liberalism, republicanism, conservatism, toleration and scientific progress. Many of these were shared with European Enlightenment thinkers, but in some instances took a uniquely American form.
The pre- and post-revolutionary era in American history generated propitious conditions for Enlightenment thought to thrive on an order comparable to that witnessed in the European Enlightenments. In the pre-revolutionary years, Americans reacted to the misrule of King George III, the unfairness of Parliament (“taxation without representation”) and exploitative treatment at the hands of a colonial power: the English Empire. The Englishman-cum-revolutionary Thomas Paine wrote the famous pamphlet The Rights of Man, decrying the abuses of the North American colonies by their English masters. In the post-revolutionary years, a whole generation of American thinkers would found a new system of government on liberal and republican principles, articulating their enduring ideas in documents such as the Declaration of Independence, the Federalist Papers and the United States Constitution.
Although distinctive features arose in the eighteenth-century American context, much of the American Enlightenment was continuous with parallel experiences in British and French society. Four themes recur in both European and American Enlightenment texts: modernization, skepticism, reason and liberty. Modernization means that beliefs and institutions based on absolute moral, religious and political authority (such as the divine right of kings and the Ancien Régime) will become increasingly eclipsed by those based on science, rationality and religious pluralism. Many Enlightenment thinkers—especially the French philosophes, such as Voltaire, Rousseau and Diderot—subscribed to some form of skepticism, doubting appeals to miraculous, transcendent and supernatural forces that potentially limit the scope of individual choice and reason. Reason that is universally shared and definitive of the human nature also became a dominant theme in Enlightenment thinkers’ writings, particularly Immanuel Kant’s “What is Enlightenment?” and his Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals. The fourth theme, liberty and rights assumed a central place in theories of political association, specifically as limits state authority originating prior to the advent of states (that is, in a state of nature) and manifesting in social contracts, especially in John Locke’s Second Treatise on Civil Government and Thomas Jefferson’s drafts of the Declaration of Independence.
Besides identifying dominant themes running throughout the Enlightenment period, some historians, such as Henry May and Jonathan Israel, understand Enlightenment thought as divisible into two broad categories, each reflecting the content and intensity of ideas prevalent at the time. The moderate Enlightenment signifies commitments to economic liberalism, religious toleration and constitutional politics. In contrast to its moderate incarnation, the radical Enlightenment conceives enlightened thought through the prism of revolutionary rhetoric and classical Republicanism. Some commentators argue that the British Enlightenment (especially figures such as James Hutton, Adam Ferguson and Adam Smith) was essentially moderate, while the French (represented by Denis Diderot, Claude Adrien Helvétius and François Marie Arouet) was decidedly more radical. Influenced as it was by the British and French, American Enlightenment thought integrates both moderate and radical elements.
American Enlightenment thought can also be appreciated chronologically, or in terms of three temporal stages in the development of Enlightenment Age thinking. The early stage stretches from the time of the Glorious Revolution of 1688 to 1750, when members of Europe’s middle class began to break free from the monarchical and aristocratic regimes—whether through scientific discovery, social and political change or emigration outside of Europe, including America. The middle stage extends from 1751 to just a few years after the start of the American Revolution in 1779. It is characterized by an exploding fascination with science, religious revivalism and experimental forms of government, especially in the United States. The late stage begins in 1780 and ends with the rise of Napoléon Bonaparte, as the French Revolution comes to a close in 1815—a period in which the European Enlightenment was in decline, while the American Enlightenment reclaimed and institutionalized many of its seminal ideas. However, American Enlightenment thinkers were not always of a single mind with their European counterparts. For instance, several American Enlightenment thinkers—particularly James Madison and John Adams, though not Benjamin Franklin—judged the French philosophes to be morally degenerate intellectuals of the era.
Many European and American Enlightenment figures were critical of democracy. Skepticism about the value of democratic institutions was likely a legacy of Plato’s belief that democracy led to tyranny and Aristotle’s view that democracy was the best of the worst forms of government. John Adams and James Madison perpetuated the elitist and anti-democratic idea that to invest too much political power in the hands of uneducated and property-less people was to put society at constant risk of social and political upheaval. Although several of America’s Enlightenment thinkers condemned democracy, others were more receptive to the idea of popular rule as expressed in European social contract theories. Thomas Jefferson was strongly influenced by John Locke’s social contract theory, while Thomas Paine found inspiration in Jean-Jacques Rousseau’s. In the Two Treatises on Government (1689 and 1690), Locke argued against the divine right of kings and in favor of government grounded on the consent of the governed; so long as people would have agreed to hand over some of their liberties enjoyed in a pre-political society or state of nature in exchange for the protection of basic rights to life, liberty and property. However, if the state reneged on the social contract by failing to protect those natural rights, then the people had a right to revolt and form a new government. Perhaps more of a democrat than Locke, Rousseau insisted in The Social Contract (1762) that citizens have a right of self-government, choosing the rules by which they live and the judges who shall enforce those rules. If the relationship between the will of the state and the will of the people (the “general will”) is to be democratic, it should be mediated by as few institutions as possible.
At least six ideas came to punctuate American Enlightenment thinking: deism, liberalism, republicanism, conservatism, toleration and scientific progress. Many of these were shared with European Enlightenment thinkers, but in some instances took a uniquely American form.
European Enlightenment thinkers conceived tradition, custom and prejudice (Vorurteil) as barriers to gaining true knowledge of the universal laws of nature. The solution was deism or understanding God’s existence as divorced from holy books, divine providence, revealed religion, prophecy and miracles; instead basing religious belief on reason and observation of the natural world. Deists appreciated God as a reasonable Deity. A reasonable God endowed humans with rationality in order that they might discover the moral instructions of the universe in the natural law. God created the universal laws that govern nature, and afterwards humans realize God’s will through sound judgment and wise action. Deists were typically (though not always) Protestants, sharing a disdain for the religious dogmatism and blind obedience to tradition exemplified by the Catholic Church. Rather than fight members of the Catholic faith with violence and intolerance, most deists resorted to the use of tamer weapons such as humor and mockery.
Both moderate and radical American Enlightenment thinkers, such as James Madison, Benjamin Franklin, Alexander Hamilton, John Adams and George Washington, were deists. Some struggled with the tensions between Calvinist orthodoxy and deist beliefs, while other subscribed to the populist version of deism advanced by Thomas Paine in The Age of Reason. Franklin was remembered for stating in the Constitutional Convention that “the longer I live, the more convincing proof I see of this truth—that God governs in the affairs of men.” In what would become known as the Jefferson Bible (originally The Life and Morals of Jesus of Nazareth), Jefferson chronicles the life and times of Jesus Christ from a deist perspective, eliminating all mention of miracles or divine intervention. God for deists such as Jefferson never loomed large in humans’ day-to-day life beyond offering a moral or humanistic outlook and the resource of reason to discover the content of God’s laws. Despite the near absence of God in human life, American deists did not deny His existence, largely because the majority of the populace still remained strongly religious, traditionally pious and supportive of the good works (for example monasteries, religious schools and community service) that the clergy did.
Another idea central to American Enlightenment thinking is liberalism, that is, the notion that humans have natural rights and that government authority is not absolute, but based on the will and consent of the governed. Rather than a radical or revolutionary doctrine, liberalism was rooted in the commercial harmony and tolerant Protestantism embraced by merchants in Northern Europe, particularly Holland and England. Liberals favored the interests of the middle class over those of the high-born aristocracy, an outlook of tolerant pluralism that did not discriminate between consumers or citizens based on their race or creed, a legal system devoted to the protection of private property rights, and an ethos of strong individualism over the passive collectivism associated with feudal arrangements. Liberals also preferred rational argumentation and free exchange of ideas to the uncritical of religious doctrine or governmental mandates. In this way, liberal thinking was anti-authoritarian. Although later liberalism became associated with grassroots democracy and a sharp separation of the public and private domains, early liberalism favored a parliamentarian form of government that protected liberty of expression and movement, the right to petition the government, separation of church and state and the confluence of public and private interests in philanthropic and entrepreneurial endeavors.
The claim that private individuals have fundamental God-given rights, such as to property, life, liberty and to pursue their conception of good, begins with the English philosopher John Locke, but also finds expression in Thomas Jefferson’s drafting of the Declaration of Independence. The U.S. Bill of Rights, the first ten amendments to the Constitution, guarantees a schedule of individual rights based on the liberal ideal. During the constitutional convention, James Madison responded to the anti-Federalists’ demand for a bill of rights as a condition of ratification by reviewing over two-hundred proposals and distilling them into an initial list of twelve suggested amendments to the Constitution, covering the rights of free speech, religious liberty, right to bear arms and habeas corpus, among others. While ten of those suggested were ratified in 1791, one missing amendment (stopping laws created by Congress to increase its members’ salaries from taking effect until the next legislative term) would have to wait until 1992 to be ratified as the Twenty-seventh Amendment. Madison’s concern that the Bill of Rights should apply not only to the federal government would eventually be accommodated with the passage of the Fourteenth Amendment (especially its due process clause) in 1868 and a series of Supreme Court cases throughout the twentieth-century interpreting each of the ten amendments as “incorporated” and thus protecting citizens against state governments as well.
Classical republicanism is a commitment to the notion that a nation ought to be ruled as a republic, in which selection of the state’s highest public official is determined by a general election, rather than through a claim to hereditary right. Republican values include civic patriotism, virtuous citizenship and property-based personality. Developed during late antiquity and early renaissance, classic republicanism differed from early liberalism insofar as rights were not thought to be granted by God in a pre-social state of nature, but were the products of living in political society. On the classical republican view of liberty, citizens exercise freedom within the context of existing social relations, historical associations and traditional communities, not as autonomous individuals set apart from their social and political ties. In this way, liberty for the classical republican is positively defined by the political society instead of negatively defined in terms of the pre-social individual’s natural rights.
While prefigured by the European Enlightenment, the American Enlightenment also promoted the idea that a nation should be governed as a republic, whereby the state’s head is popularly elected, not appointed through a hereditary blood-line. As North American colonists became increasingly convinced that British rule was corrupt and inimical to republican values, they joined militias and eventually formed the American Continental Army under George Washington’s command. The Jeffersonian ideal of the yeoman farmer, which had its roots in the similar Roman ideal, represented the eighteenth-century American as both a hard-working agrarian and as a citizen-soldier devoted to the republic. When elected to the highest office of the land, George Washington famously demurred when offered a royal title, preferring instead the more republican title of President. Though scholarly debate persists over the relative importance of liberalism and republicanism during the American Revolution and Founding (see Recent Work section), the view that republican ideas were a formative influence on American Enlightenment thinking has gained widespread acceptance.
Though the Enlightenment is more often associated with liberalism and republicanism, an undeniable strain of conservatism emerged in the last stage of the Enlightenment, mainly as a reaction to the excesses of the French Revolution. In 1790 Edmund Burkeanticipated the dissipation of order and decency in French society following the revolution (often referred to as “the Terror”) in his Reflections on the Revolution in France. Though it is argued that Burkean conservatism was a reaction to the Enlightenment (or anti-Enlightenment), conservatives were also operating within the framework of Enlightenment ideas. Some Enlightenment claims about human nature are turned back upon themselves and shown to break down when applied more generally to human culture. For instance, Enlightenment faith in universal declarations of human rights do more harm than good when they contravene the conventions and traditions of specific nations, regions and localities. Similar to the classical republicans, Burke believed that human personality was the product of living in a political society, not a set of natural rights that predetermined our social and political relations. Conservatives attacked the notion of a social contract (prominent in the work of Hobbes, Locke and Rousseau) as a mythical construction that overlooked the plurality of groups and perspectives in society, a fact which made brokering compromises inevitable and universal consent impossible. Burke only insisted on a tempered version, not a wholesale rejection of Enlightenment values.
Conservatism featured strongly in American Enlightenment thinking. While Burke was critical of the French Revolution, he supported the American Revolution for disposing of English colonial misrule while creatively readapting British traditions and institutions to the American temperament. American Enlightenment thinkers such as James Madison and John Adams held views that echoed and in some cases anticipated Burkean conservatism, leading them to criticize the rise of revolutionary France and the popular pro-French Jacobin clubs during and after the French Revolution. In the forty-ninth Federalist Paper, James Madison deployed a conservative argument against frequent appeals to democratic publics on constitutional questions because they threatened to undermine political stability and substitute popular passion for the “enlightened reason” of elected representatives. Madison’s conservative view was opposed to Jefferson’s liberal view that a constitutional convention should be convened every twenty years, for “[t]he earth belongs to the living generation,” and so each new generation should be empowered to reconsider its constitutional norms.
Toleration or tolerant pluralism was also a major theme in American Enlightenment thought. Tolerance of difference developed in parallel with the early liberalism prevalent among Northern Europe’s merchant class. It reflected their belief that hatred or fear of other races and creeds interfered with economic trade, extinguished freedom of thought and expression, eroded the basis for friendship among nations and led to persecution and war. Tiring of religious wars (particularly as the 16th century French wars of religion and the 17th century Thirty Years War), European Enlightenment thinkers imagined an age in which enlightened reason not religious dogmatism governed relations between diverse peoples with loyalties to different faiths. The Protestant Reformation and the Treaty of Westphalia significantly weakened the Catholic Papacy, empowered secular political institutions and provided the conditions for independent nation-states to flourish.
American thinkers inherited this principle of tolerant pluralism from their European Enlightenment forebearers. Inspired by the Scottish Enlightenment thinkers John Knox and George Buchanan, American Calvinists created open, friendly and tolerant institutions such as the secular public school and democratically organized religion (which became the Presbyterian Church). Many American Enlightenment thinkers, including Benjamin Franklin, Thomas Jefferson and James Madison, read and agreed with John Locke’s A Letter Concerning Toleration. In it, Locke argued that government is ill-equipped to judge the rightness or wrongness of opposing religious doctrines, faith could not be coerced and if attempted the result would be greater religious and political discord. So, civil government ought to protect liberty of conscience, the right to worship as one chooses (or not to worship at all) and refrain from establishing an official state-sanctioned church. For America’s founders, the fledgling nation was to be a land where persons of every faith or no faith could settle and thrive peacefully and cooperatively without fear of persecution by government or fellow citizens. Ben Franklin’s belief that religion was an aid to cultivating virtue led him to donate funds to every church in Philadelphia. Defending freedom of conscience, James Madison would write that “[c]onscience is the most sacred of all property.” In 1777, Thomas Jefferson drafted a religious liberty bill for Virginia to disestablish the government-sponsored Anglican Church—often referred to as “the precursor to the Religion Clauses of the First Amendment”—which eventually passed with James Madison’s help.
The Enlightenment enthusiasm for scientific discovery was directly related to the growth of deism and skepticism about received religious doctrine. Deists engaged in scientific inquiry not only to satisfy their intellectual curiosity, but to respond to a divine calling to expose God’s natural laws. Advances in scientific knowledge—whether the rejection of the geocentric model of the universe because of Copernicus, Kepler and Galileo’s work or the discovery of natural laws such as Newton’s mathematical explanation of gravity—removed the need for a constantly intervening God. With the release of Sir Isaac Newton’s Principia in 1660, faith in scientific progress took institutional form in the Royal Society of England, the Académie des Sciences in France and later the Academy of Sciences in Germany. In pre-revolutionary America, scientists or natural philosophers belonged to the Royal Society until 1768, when Benjamin Franklin helped create and then served as the first president of the American Philosophical Society. Franklin became one of the most famous American scientists during the Enlightenment period because of his many practical inventions and his theoretical work on the properties of electricity.
What follows are brief accounts of how four significant thinkers contributed to the eighteenth-century American Enlightenment: Benjamin Franklin, Thomas Jefferson, James Madison and John Adams.
Benjamin Franklin, the author, printer, scientist and statesman who led America through a tumultuous period of colonial politics, a revolutionary war and its momentous, though no less precarious, founding as a nation. In his Autobiography, he extolled the virtues of thrift, industry and money-making (or acquisitiveness). For Franklin, the self-interested pursuit of material wealth is only virtuous when it coincides with the promotion of the public good through philanthropy and voluntarism—what is often called “enlightened self-interest.” He believed that reason, free trade and a cosmopolitan spirit serve as faithful guides for nation-states to cultivate peaceful relations. Within nation-states, Franklin thought that “independent entrepreneurs make good citizens” because they pursue “attainable goals” and are “capable of living a useful and dignified life.” In his autobiography, Franklin claims that the way to “moral perfection” is to cultivate thirteen virtues (temperance, silence, order, resolution, frugality, industry, sincerity, justice, moderation, cleanliness, tranquility, chastity, and humility) as well as a healthy dose of “cheerful prudence.” Franklin favored voluntary associations over governmental institutions as mechanisms to channel citizens’ extreme individualism and isolated pursuit of private ends into productive social outlets. Not only did Franklin advise his fellow citizens to create and join these associations, but he also founded and participated in many himself. Franklin was a staunch defender of federalism, a critic of narrow parochialism, a visionary leader in world politics and a strong advocate of religious liberty.
A Virginian statesman, scientist and diplomat, Jefferson is probably best known for drafting the Declaration of Independence. Agreeing with Benjamin Franklin, he substituted “pursuit of happiness” for “property” in Locke’s schedule of natural rights, so that liberty to pursue the widest possible human ends would be accommodated. Jefferson also exercised immense influence over the creation of the United States’ Constitution through his extended correspondence with James Madison during the 1787 Constitutional Convention (since Jefferson was absent, serving as a diplomat in Paris). Just as Jefferson saw the Declaration as a test of the colonists’ will to revolt and separate from Britain, he also saw the Convention in Philadelphia, almost eleven years later, as a grand experiment in creating a new constitutional order. Panel four of the Jefferson Memorial records how Thomas Jefferson viewed constitutions: “I am not an advocate for frequent changes in laws and constitutions, but laws and institutions must go hand in hand with the progress of the human mind. As that becomes more developed, more enlightened, as new discoveries are made, new truths discovered and manners and opinions change, with the change of circumstances, institutions must advance also to keep pace with the times.” Jefferson’s words capture the spirit of organic constitutionalism, the idea that constitutions are living documents that transform over time in pace with popular thought, imagination and opinion.
Heralded as the “Father of the Constitution,” James Madison was, besides one of the most influential architects of the U.S. Constitution, a man of letters, a politician, a scientist and a diplomat who left an enduring legacy on American philosophical thought. As a tireless advocate for the ratification of the Constitution, Madison advanced his most groundbreaking ideas in his jointly authoring The Federalist Papers with John Jay and Alexander Hamilton. Indeed, two of his most enduring ideas—the large republic thesis and the argument for separation-of-powers and checks-and-balances—are contained there. In the tenth Federalist paper, Madison explains the problem of factions, namely, that the development of groups with shared interests (advocates or interest groups) is inevitable and dangerous to republican government. If we try to vanquish factions, then we will in turn destroy the liberty upon which their existence and activities are founded. Baron d’ Montesquieu, the seventeenth-century French philosopher, believed that the only way to have a functioning republic, one that was sufficiently democratic, was for it to be small, both in population and land mass (on the order of Ancient Athens or Sparta). He then argues that a large and diverse republic will stop the formation of a majority faction; if small groups cannot communicate over long distances and coordinate effectively, the threat will be negated and liberty will be preserved (“you make it less probable that a majority of the whole will have a common motive to invade the rights of other citizens”). When factions formed inside the government, a clever institutional design of checks and balances (first John Adams’s idea, where each branch would have a hand in the others’ domain) would avert excessive harm, so that “ambition must be made to counteract ambition” and, consequently, government will effectively “control itself.”
John Adams was also a founder, statesman, diplomat and eventual President who contributed to American Enlightenment thought. Among his political writings, three stand out: Dissertation on the Canon and Feudal Law (1776), A Defense of the Constitutions of Government of the United States of America, Against the Attack of M. Turgot (1787-8), and Discourses on Davila (1791). In the Dissertation, Adams faults Great Britain for deciding to introduce canon and feudal law, “the two greatest systems of tyranny,” to the North American colonies. Once introduced, elections ceased in the North American colonies, British subjects felt enslaved and revolution became inevitable. In the Defense, Adams offers an uncompromising defense of republicanism. He disputes Turgot’s apology for unified and centralized government, arguing that insurance against consolidated state power and support for individual liberty require separating government powers between branches and installing careful checks and balances. Nevertheless, a strong executive branch is needed to defend the people against “aristocrats” who will attempt to deprive liberty from the mass of people. Revealing the Enlightenment theme of conservatism, Adams criticized the notion of unrestricted popular rule or pure democracy in the Discourses. Since humans are always desirous of increasing their personal power and reputation, all the while making invidious comparisons, government must be designed to constrain the effects of these passionate tendencies. Adams writes: “Consider that government is intended to set bounds to passions which nature has not limited; and to assist reason, conscience, justice, and truth in controlling interests which, without it, would be as unjust as uncontrollable.”
Invocations of universal freedom draw their inspiration from Enlightenment thinkers such as John Locke, Immanuel Kant, and Thomas Jefferson, but come into conflict with contemporary liberal appeals to multiculturalism and pluralism. Each of these Enlightenment thinkers sought to ground the legitimacy of the state on a theory of rational-moral political order reflecting universal truths about human nature—for instance, that humans are carriers of inalienable rights (Locke), autonomous agents (Kant), or fundamentally equal creations (Jefferson). However, many contemporary liberals—for instance, Graeme Garrard, John Gray and Richard Rorty—fault Enlightenment liberalism for its failure to acknowledge and accommodate the differences among citizens’ incompatible and equally reasonable religious, moral and philosophical doctrines, especially in multicultural societies. According to these critics, Enlightenment liberalism, rather than offering a neutral framework, discloses a full-blooded doctrine that competes with alternative views of truth, the good life, and human nature. This pluralist critique of Enlightenment liberalism’s universalism makes it difficult to harmonize the American Founders’ appeal to universal human rights with their insistence on religious tolerance. However, as previously noted, evidence of Burkean conservatism offers an alternative to the strong universalism that these recent commentators criticize in American Enlightenment thought.
What in recent times has been characterized as the ‘Enlightenment project’ is the general idea that human rationality can and should be made to serve ethical and humanistic ends. If human societies are to achieve genuine moral progress, parochialism, dogma and prejudice ought to give way to science and reason in efforts to solve pressing problems. The American Enlightenment project signifies how America has taken a leading role in promoting Enlightenment ideals during that period of human history commonly referred to as ‘modernity.’ Still, there is no consensus about the exact legacy of American Enlightenment thinkers—for instance, whether republican or liberal ideas are predominant. Until the publication of J. G. A. Pocock’s The Machiavellian Moment (1975), most scholars agreed that liberal (especially Lockean) ideas were more dominant than republican ones. Pockock’s work initiated a sea change towards what is now the widely accepted view that liberal and republican ideas had relatively equal sway during the eighteenth-century Enlightenment, both in America and Europe. Gordon Wood and Bernard Bailyn contend that republicanism was dominant and liberalism recessive in American Enlightenment thought. Isaac Kramnick still defends the orthodox position that American Enlightenment thinking was exclusively Lockean and liberal, thus explaining the strongly individualistic character of modern American culture.
Shane J. Ralston
Pennsylvania State University
U. S. A.
Last updated: November 2, 2011 | Originally published: