Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

American Philosophy

The term “American Philosophy,” perhaps surprisingly, has been somewhat vague. While it has tended to primarily include philosophical work done by Americans within the geographical confines of the United States, this has not been exclusively the case. For example, Alfred North Whitehead came to the United States relatively late in life. On the other hand, George Santayana spent much of his life outside of the United States. Until only recently, the term was used to refer to philosophers of European descent. Another focus for defining, or at least characterizing, American Philosophy has been on the types of philosophical concerns and problems addressed. While American philosophers have worked on traditional areas of philosophy, such as metaphysics, epistemology, and axiology, this is not unique to American Philosophy. Many scholars have highlighted American philosophers’ focus on the interconnections of theory and practice, on experience and community, though these, too, are not unique to American Philosophy. The people, movements, schools of thought and philosophical traditions that have constituted American Philosophy have been varied and often at odds with each other. Different concerns and themes have waxed or waned at different times. For instance, the analysis of language was important throughout much of the twentieth century, but of very little concern before then, while the relation between philosophy and religion, of great significance early in American Philosophy, paled in importance during much of the twentieth century. Despite having no core of defining features, American Philosophy can nevertheless be seen as both reflecting and shaping collective American identity over the history of the nation.

Table of Contents

  1. 17th Century
  2. 18th Century
  3. 19th Century
    1. Charles Peirce
    2. William James
    3. John Dewey
    4. Other Pragmatists
  4. 20th Century and Recent
  5. References and Further Reading

1. 17th Century

Though many people, communities and nations populated the area that is now the United States long before the U.S.A. became a nation-state, and they all wrestled with universal philosophical questions such as the nature of the self, the relationships between persons, their origins and destiny, most histories of American Philosophy begin with European colonization, especially from the time of the Puritans in New England. From the “Mayflower Compact,” penned in 1620 as the early English settlers arrived in the New World, basic socio-political positions were made explicit and fundamental to newly established communities. Speaking of forming a covenant to “combine ourselves into a civil Body Politic,” those arriving on the Mayflower immediately identified a close and ineliminable connection between individuals and their community. This sentiment was echoed in founding documents of other colonies, such as the Fundamental Orders of Connecticut (1639) and the Massachusetts Body of Liberties (1641). Likewise, the writings of prominent early colonial leaders, such as John Winthrop (1588-1649) emphasized “the care of the public must oversway all private respects…for it is a true rule that particular estates cannot subsist in the ruin of the public.” Although highly influential, such views were not universal, as the Maryland Toleration Act (1649) and the writings of other influential leaders, e.g., Roger Williams (1603-1683) stressed religious tolerance over commitment to the religious covenant of a community. From the earliest concerns, then, even prior to the establishment of the United States, the social and political issues of the relation of individuals to their communities as well as the nature of the communities themselves (that is, as secular or religious) were paramount.

2. 18th Century

Broadly speaking, American Philosophy in the eighteenth century can be divided into two halves, the first still heavily influenced by the Calvinism of the Puritans and the second more directly along the lines of the European Enlightenment and associated with the political philosophy of the Founding Fathers (e.g., Thomas Jefferson, Benjamin Franklin).

Far and away the most significant thinker of the first half of the 18th century for American Philosophy was Jonathan Edwards (1703-1758). Often associated primarily with the fiery oratory of sermons such as “Sinners in the Hands of an Angry God,” and the religious revivalist “Great Awakening” of the 1740s, Edwards both distilled and assimilated Calvinist theological thought and the emergent Newtonian scientific worldview. Frequently characterized as trying to synthesize a Christian Platonism, with an emphasis on the reality of a spiritual world, with an empiricist epistemology, an emphasis on Lockean sensation and Newtonian corpuscular physics, Edwards drew directly from the thought of Bishop George Berkeley, who stressed the necessity of mind (or non-material reality) to make sense of human experience. This non-material mind, for Edwards, consists of understanding and will, both of which are passive at root. It is understanding that, along lines of the successes of Newtonian physics, leads to the fundamental metaphysical category of Resistance, which Edwards characterizes as “the primary quality of objects.” That is, whatever features objects might have, what is fundamental to something qua object is that is resists. This power of resistance is “the actual exertion of God’s power” and is demonstrated by Newton’s basic laws of motion, in which objects at rest or in motion will remain undeterred until and unless acted on by some other force (that is, resisted). Understanding, though, is different than will. Edwards is perhaps best known for his rejection of free will. As he remarked, “we can do as we please, but we cannot please as we please.” Just as there is natural necessity and natural inability, for Edwards, there is moral necessity and moral inability. Every act of will is connected to understanding, and thus determined. Echoing the views of John Calvin, Edwards saw not (good) works, but the grace of God as the determiner of human fortune.

While couched primarily in a religious context for Edwards but less so for others, the acceptance and adaptation of a Newtonian worldview was something shared by most American philosophers in the latter half of the 18th century. These later thinkers, however, abandoned to a great extent the religious context and focused rather on social-political issues. Sharing many commitments of European philosophers of the Age of Enlightenment (such as a reliance on reason and science, a broad faith in scientific and social progress along with a belief in the perfectibility of humans, a strong advocacy of political democracy and laissez-faire economics), many of the famous names of American history identified themselves with this enlightenment thought. While they attended very little to basic issues of metaphysics or epistemology, the Founding Fathers, such as Thomas Jefferson (1743-1826), Benjamin Franklin (1706-1790), and James Madison (1751-1836), wrote voluminously on social and political philosophy. The American Declaration of Independence as well as the United States Constitution, with its initial amendments, better known as the Bill of Rights, was drafted at this time, with their emphasis on religious toleration. Though including explicit references to God, these thinkers tended to commit themselves in their writings less to Christianity per se and more to deism, the view of God as creator of a world governed by natural laws (which they believed were explicated for the most part by Newton) but not directly involved with human action. For example, as early as 1730 and as late as 1790 Franklin spoke of God as world-creator and Jesus as providing a system of morality but with no direct commitment to the divinity of Jesus or to any organized church. Instead, a major focus of concern was the appropriate nature of the State and its relation to individuals. While the thought of Thomas Jefferson, exemplified in the language of the Declaration of Independence, emphasized natural, inalienable rights of individuals against the tyranny of the State – with the legitimacy of the State only in securing the rights of individuals – federalists such as James Madison highlighted dangers of factional democracy, with his view of protecting both individual rights and the public good.

3. 19th Century

In a letter to John Adams written in 1814, Thomas Jefferson complained that, while the post-revolutionary American youth lived in happier times than their parents, this younger generation held “all knowledge which is not innate, [to be] in contempt, or neglect at least.” Their “folly” included endorsing “self-learning and self-sufficiency; of rejecting the knowledge acquired in past ages, and starting on the new ground of intuition.” These complaints reflected Jefferson’s concerns about the rise of romanticism in early nineteenth century America. Transcendentalism, or American Romanticism, was the first of several major traditions to characterize philosophical thought in America’s first full century as a nation, with Transcendentalism succeeded by the impact of Darwinian evolutionary thought and finally developing into America’s most renowned school of thought, Pragmatism. A Hegelian movement, centered in St. Louis and identified largely with its chief proponent, George Holmes Howison (1834-1916), occurred in the second half of the nineteenth century, but was overshadowed by the rise of Pragmatism. Even the journal founded in 1867 by the St. Louis Hegelians, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, became best known later on because of its publication of essays by the pragmatist Charles Peirce (1839-1914).

Where the thinkers of the American enlightenment stressed social and political concerns, based on a Newtonian mechanistic view of the world, the thinkers of American Transcendentalism took the emphasis on individuals and their relation to the community in a different direction. This direction was based not on a mechanistic view of the world, but on an organic metaphor that stressed the subjective nature of human experience and existence. Highlighting personal experience and often even a fairly mystical holism, writers such as Ralph Waldo Emerson (1803-1882), Henry David Thoreau (1817-1872), and Walt Whitman (1819-1892) argued for the priority of personal non-cognitive, emotional connections to nature and to the world as a whole. Human are agents in the world more fundamentally than they are knowers of the world. “Real” knowledge is intuitive and personal; it transcends scientific understanding that is based on empirical sense experience. Because of this, those things that constrain or restrict free personal thought, such as conventional morality and political institutions, need to be transcended as well. This spirit is captured in the poetry of Walt Whitman’s “Song of Myself” in which he claims, “I celebrate myself…Unscrew the locks from the doors! Unscrew the doors themselves from their jambs! I speak the past-word primeval, I give the sign of democracy….” This sentiment is echoed in the works of Emerson and Thoreau, both of whom argue for the importance of self-reliance, intuition, and a return to nature, i.e., an embracing of what is non-civilized and non-industrial. In his 1836 paper, “Nature,” Emerson states, “In the woods, we return to reason and faith…I am nothing; I see all; the currents of the Universal Being circulate through me; I am part or parcel of God…In the wilderness I find something more dear and connate than in streets and villages.” Emerson’s “The Transcendentalist” (1842) stands as a manifesto of this philosophical movement, in which he explicitly identifies Transcendentalism as a form of philosophical Idealism. Emerson wrote:

As thinkers, mankind have ever been divided into two sects, Materialists and Idealists; the first class founding on experience, the second on consciousness; the first class beginning to think from the data of the senses, the second class perceive that the senses are not final, and say, The senses give us representations of things, but what are the things themselves, they cannot tell…Society is good when it does not violate me, but best when it is likest to solitude. Everything real is self-existent. Everything divine shares the self-existence of Deity…[Kant showed] there was a very important class of ideas or imperative forms, which did not come by way of experience, but through which experience was acquired; that these were intuitions of the mind itself; and he denominated them Transcendental forms.

At the same time, during the 1830s and 1840s, there were other thinkers who stressed greater social and political equality, particularly several important women writers and activists, such as Sarah Grimké (1792-1873) and Elizabeth Cady Stanton (1815-1902). The call for social and political emancipation, in many ways a call to fulfill the promise of the American enlightenment, came not just from women such as Grimké and Stanton, but also from those demanding the abolition of slavery, notably William Lloyd Garrison (1805-1879) and Frederick Douglass (1817-1895).

Just as much of American philosophical thought was influenced by the success of Newton’s scientific worldview throughout the eighteenth century, the publication of Charles Darwin’s evolutionary theory in 1859 had a great impact on subsequent American philosophy. Though not known widely outside of academic circles, two thinkers in particular wrote passionately for re-conceiving philosophical concerns and positions along Darwinian lines, John Fiske (1842-1901) and Chauncey Wright (1830-1875). Both stressed the need to understand consciousness and morality in terms of their evolutionary development. Such a naturalistic, evolutionary approach became even more pronounced at the end of the twentieth century. It was outside of academia, however, often under the label of “Social Darwinism” that this view had even greater impact and influence, especially via the writings of Herbert Spencer (1820-1903) and William Graham Sumner (1840-1910). Both Spencer and Sumner likened societies to organisms, in a struggle for survival. Indeed, it was Spencer, not Darwin, who coined the term “survival of the fittest” to capture what he (and many others) took to be the significance of evolutionary theory. If groups within a society, and even societies themselves, are – like biological organisms – in a constant competition for survival, then a sign of their fitness is the fact that the do in fact survive, for Spencer. Such competition, indeed, is useful and good, for in the long run those that survive will have competed and won, a clear statement of their superiority. Spencer, Sumner and others, such as the industrialist Andrew Carnegie (1835-1919), argued that the social implication of the fact of such struggle for survival is that free-market capitalism is the natural economic system and the one that will ensure the greatest success for a society’s economic well-being. In Sumner’s essay, “The Man of Virtue,” he remarks that, “Every man and woman in society has one big duty. That is, to take care of his or her own self…Society, therefore, does not need any care or supervision.” Carnegie’s “The Gospel of Wealth” echoes this view: “[The law of competition] is here, we cannot evade it; no substitutes for it have been found; and while the law may be sometimes hard for the individual, it is best for the race, because it insures the survival of the fittest in every department…the law of competition [is] not only beneficial, but essential to the future progress of the race.” The emphasis on competition as the key to evolutionary thought was not shared by everyone, however. One prominent advocate of Darwin, who nevertheless argued that cooperation rather than competition was the message of evolutionary thought, was Lester Ward (1841-1913). Not only are those groups that cooperate and function together as a group more likely to survive than those that don’t, he claimed, but human history has shown that government is a natural, emergent feature of human societies, rather than, contra Sumner, a hindrance and impediment to progress.

After Transcendentalism and evolutionary philosophy, the third and by far most renowned philosophical movement in nineteenth century America was Pragmatism. Informally christened as “pragmatism” in the 1870s by one of its most famous proponents, Charles Sanders Peirce, Pragmatism is seen by most philosophers today as the classic American philosophical tradition. Not easily definable, Pragmatism is a constellation of principles, stances, and philosophical commitments, some of which are more or less salient for particular pragmatism philosophers (as will be noted below). Nevertheless, there are threads that run across and through most pragmatists. There is a strong naturalistic bent, meaning that they look for an understanding of phenomena and concepts in terms of how they arose and how they play a part in our engagement with the world. Peirce’s “pragmatic maxim” captures this stance as follows: “Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then, our conception of these effects is the whole of our conception of the object.” There is a rejection of a foundationalist view of knowledge. All knowledge claims are fallible and revisable. The flip side of such fallibility and revisibility is that no inquiry is disinterested. Beliefs are fundamentally instruments for us to cope with the contingencies of the world. In addition, there is an enunciated commitment to intersubjectivity and community. So, while rejecting the notion of any pure “givens,” of experience, pragmatists also reject any pure subjectivism or abandonment of standards or criteria of adjudication beyond the individual. Unlike the American philosophical movements that preceded Pragmatism, pragmatists wrestled with issues and concerns across the philosophical spectrum, from basic metaphysics to epistemology to all forms of axiology (ethical, political, and even aesthetic).

a. Charles Peirce

Generally acknowledged as the “Big Three” classical pragmatists are Charles Peirce, William James (1842-1910), and John Dewey (1859-1952). Peirce, a polymath by all accounts, not only coined the term “pragmatism” in the 1870s, but did ground-breaking work in semiotics (the study of signs) as well as in logic, particularly in the logic of relations. In addition, while a scientist and mathematician by trade, he wrote a considerable amount on the philosophy of science (for example, on the nature of explanation), value theory, and metaphysics, including seminal work on categories. From his early writings in the 1860s, in which he criticized Cartesian doubt and foundationalist search for indubitability, to his later works on cognition and what he termed “evolutionary cosmology,” Peirce continuously and consistently argued against forms of nominalism and in favor of realism, both in the sense that non-particulars are real (though perhaps not existent) and in the sense that our conceptions are of things independent of us. An important feature of Peirce’s pragmatism is a strident rejection of subjectivism. This comes through in his insistence that, as inquirers do not exist in isolation, beliefs are not fulfilled (as he put it, the irritation of doubt is not overcome) in isolation. Rather, it is the development of successful habit that matters and it is the verdict of the community of inquirers in the long run that matters in the determination of what settles inquiry. Just as this is not a subjectivist view of what is real or true, it is also not a “social constructivist” view, in which what is real or true is determined by what society decides. Instead, as in the model of good science, there is a community of inquirers who form a system of checks and balances for any belief, but this community of inquirers operates within a world of objects, qualities, relations, and laws.

In establishing his notion of pragmatism as a means of clarifying and determining the meaning of signs, Peirce coined his “Pragmatic Maxim,” noted above. This maxim not only points to pragmatism as a criterion of meaningfulness but also to pragmatism as a standard of truth. For Peirce, belief is not merely a cognitive state of an isolated agent, rather it encompasses an awareness of a state of affairs along with the appeasement of the irritation of doubt (or surprise) and – as genuine belief and not simply verbiage – the establishment of a habit, or rule of action. This requirement of a rule of action carries over for Peirce beyond epistemological concerns to metaphysical ones as well, particularly in his work on categories, or fundamental modes of being. Using varied terminology at different times, Peirce identified three fundamental categories of being. One category was that of Quality (or Firstness). This is the conception of being independent of anything else, such as the example of a pure tone or color. A second category was that of Brute Fact (or Secondness), that is being relative to or connected with something else. This might be a particular instance of a tone or a color sample. This is what he sometimes called the “demonstrative application” of a sign. Finally, there is Law, or Habit (or Thirdness), or mediation whereby a First and Second are brought into relation. This is the notion of regularity and representation, and as such involves a regulative as well as descriptive aspect. An example is a red light indicating the need to stop or perhaps indicating danger. Law, habit, regularity are neither reducible to the particular instances that are true of it (that is, Secondness) nor to the pure material quality of what is instantiated in those particulars (that is, Firstness). For Peirce, these three categories are all real, are all irreducible to the others, and are all involved in any form or act of inquiry. In particular, his insistence on the reality of Habit/Law was basic, as was noted above, to his advocacy of a pragmatist conception of inquiry.

b. William James

William James, known during his lifetime as much for his work in psychology as for his work in philosophy, did much more than Peirce to popularize the label and notion of pragmatism, both as a philosophical method for resolving disputes and as a theory of meaning and truth. Though James himself also argued against subjectivism and for the importance of “older truths” (that is, established facts), his writings led many others (including Peirce) to see his position as much more relativist and nominalist-leaning. James stressed the practical effects of belief and assertion, claiming that truth is a species of good (what it is ultimately good for us to believe). Much of James’s philosophical work was aimed at dissolving many of the traditional philosophical puzzles and conundrums by showing that they made no practical difference in our lives or that they rested on mistaken and fruitless assumptions. For example, the traditional metaphysical concern of the nature of substance, as a category of things underlying and separable from attributes, has led to philosophers since the time of Plato to argue back and forth without any apparent solution. For James, the only significance of such an issue is what effect on our subsequent experience is likely to occur given the adoption of some position with respect to this issue. Likewise, any stance on, say, the existence of God, will matter only if adopting a belief (for or against such existence) will shape our future experience for the better. Since beliefs are instruments for coping with the world, those beliefs that are good for us, those that indeed help us cope, are the ones that are true. Of course, the goodness and coping-value of some beliefs might be negligible as in my beliefs that Romans wore socks while in Britain. The point for James is not the level or strength of goodness, but the appropriate criterion of truth and significance. While James, then, often focused on trying to dissolve long-standing philosophical puzzles, he also offered substantive positions on many issues. He argued for what is now called a compatibalist view of free will (that human freedom is compatible with some forms of determinism) as well as against a dualist view of mind. With respect to some traditional philosophical issues, e.g., freedom vs. determinism, he advocated a particular position because he did see predictable good or bad consequences. With respect to determinism, for example, he argued that a belief in determinism leads to a feeling of fatalism and a capitulation to the status quo; hence, it is not better for us.

In metaphysics, he is still known for his view of “radical empiricism,” in which he argued that relations between objects are as real as the properties of objects. This view, he claimed, consisted in outline of a postulate, a statement of fact, and a generalized conclusion. The postulate is that the only things that shall be debatable among philosophers shall be things definable in terms drawn from experience. The statement of fact is that the relations between things are just as much matters of direct particular experience as the things themselves or their properties. For example, when one looks at a cat and a mouse, not only are those two objects (and their properties, such as their color and shape) immediate aspects of my visual experience, but so is the relation of their relative sizes; that is, it is also an aspect of my immediate visual experience that I see that the cat is larger than the mouse. Seeing the cat as being larger than the mouse is just as immediate as seeing that the cat is black and the mouse is gray. The generalized conclusion is that the parts of experience hold together from next to next by relations that are themselves parts of experience. As James puts it, the “directly apprehended universe needs, in short, no extraneous trans-empirical connective support, but possesses in its own right a concatenated or continuous structure.”

Another metaphysical commitment of James is that of pluralism, i.e., that there is no single correct description or account of the world. With his consequentialist, future-oriented pragmatist view, focusing on effective possibilities, James argued that there can be multiple warranted or “true” accounts. Not only can there be different good accounts, but different correct accounts. In holding this view, James rejects a straight correspondence view of truth (what he calls “the copy theory”) in which truth is simply a relation between a belief and a state of affairs. Rather, truth involves both a belief and facts about the world, but also other background beliefs and, indeed, future consequences. For James, then, the very distinction between a good account and a correct account is not a sharp dichotomy. This does not mean that any account is as good as any other; clearly that is false. Rather, there can be different accounts that not only make sense of present and past knowledge and experience, but lead to useful future experiences. What will determine the truth or warrantability of an account will be its consequences (e.g., are predictions based on it borne out in experience, does it promote physical and spiritual flourishing, does it survive intersubjective scrutiny?).

c. John Dewey

Born a generation after Peirce and James, and living decades past them both, John Dewey produced a body of work that reached a far greater audience than either of his predecessors. Like Peirce and James, Dewey engaged in academic philosophical writing, publishing many essays and books on metaphysics, epistemology, and value theory. Unlike Peirce and James, though, he also wrote a vast amount on social and political philosophy and very often engaged in dialogue outside of the academy. He became nationally known as an education reformer, frequently participating in public forums, and producing highly influential works such as Democracy and Education. His social and political writings, such as The Public and Its Problems, reached an audience far beyond academic philosophers. Within philosophy proper, Dewey is probably best known for his work on inquiry and logic. Stating that all inquiry is conducted by agents, and not merely by passive information processors, he emphasized the experimental and instrumental nature of human conduct. Taking inquiry to be “the controlled transformation of an indeterminate situation so as to convert the elements of the original situation into a unified whole,” Dewey argued that logic, formal rules of inference and implication, are ultimately generalizations of warranted, or warrantable, conclusions. Logic is a species of inquiry, and the latter is never disinterested or free of valuation. This emphasis on purposeful interaction between agents and environments points to Dewey’s well-known criticism of what he termed “the quest for certainty.” Too much human activity (with philosophers being primary culprits) has been a search for absolutes, whether in the area of ontology, epistemology, or ethics. This, for Dewey, is mistaken. The world is filled with contingencies and is in flux. Human inquiry should be a matter of purposeful action in response to, and ultimately in anticipation of, such contingencies and change. Intelligence is experimental and evaluative; we learn by doing, by engagement with the puzzles and problems presented by a changing environment. While there might not be eternal, absolute standards or criteria for, say, moral judgment, it is also the case that there are criteria that transcend subjective preferences, since there are facts about the contingencies and problems we face.

Constantly and consistently stressing a naturalistic account of human activity, Dewey (like James) saw human inquiry as the entertainment of hypotheses and intelligence as evaluative. Preferring to call his philosophical approaches “instrumentalist” rather than “pragmatist,” Dewey emphasized the contingent, purposive nature of human action. This “learning-by-doing” view carried over into his metaphysical commitments. For example, he frequently stressed the position that an agent can only be fully understood as one pole in a person-environment interaction, not merely as a subject bumping into a world of objects. This carried over into more immediately practical areas, such as his educational theory. Here he strongly advocated formal schooling as a means to enhance the autonomy of persons, whereby that autonomy is understood as the ability of persons to frame purposes, plans and life goals along with the skills and abilities to carry those purposes and plans and goals into effect. An education that is relevant to meaningful experiences is one that recognizes and is based on two principles: a principle of continuity (we are temporal agents and today’s experiences are part of a continuum with yesterday’s and tomorrow’s) as well as a principle of interaction (we are social beings and one’s experiences are inherently and ineliminably interwoven with the experiences of others).

Frequently critiquing and rejecting dichotomies that he saw as unfounded and unsustainable, Dewey argued often against a fact/value dichotomy. What is good (or bad) is relative to contexts and goals, but at the same time is a matter of what helps an organism cope with and flourish in the world. Drawing from a Darwinian heritage and writing as an early proponent of what is now seen as evolutionary and naturalistic ethics, Dewey growth is the only moral end. Adaptation and adjustment to different and changing environments, including social and moral environments, are the signs of appropriate action. In the interaction with one’s environments, an agent must decide among goals and choices of action, based on predicted outcomes. Appraising situations and deliberating on likely outcomes is what Dewey refers to as “valuation.” This process of valuation, for Dewey, clearly demonstrates the useless and mistaken notion of a fact/value dichotomy.

Finally, along with arguing for valuation at the level of the individual organism or person, Dewey wrote voluminously on valuation at the level of the group or community. Often speaking of democracy as a way of life, he claimed that full self-realization requires community and emphasized this self-realization in the context of individuals’ participation in social collectives. Social arrangements, in fact, are means of “creating” individuals, for Dewey, not oppressive or repressive impositions on them (at least, not by their nature; social arrangements could be oppressive and repressive, but not merely by being social). Social arrangements, far from being foreign impositions on our freedom, are both “natural” and can be enhancing of our individual freedom. Dewey fleshes out this claim by distinguishing two types of freedom: freedom of movement and freedom of intelligence. Freedom of movement is what some philosophers refer to by the expression “freedom from.” To be free in this sense means that one is free from external constraints on one’s movements. This, says Dewey, is certainly an important sense of freedom, but it is only a sense that is a means toward a more important end, which he designates as a fuller sort of freedom, namely, freedom of intelligence (or what some philosophers call “freedom to”). Simply having no (significant) external constraints on one’s movements does not lead to or entail self-realization. As he put it in The Public and Its Problems: “No man and no mind was ever emancipated merely by being left alone.” What one is free to do, what one does with that absence of constraint is a much more important sense of freedom for Dewey. He expresses this fuller sense of freedom is a variety of ways throughout his writings, e.g., it is “a sound instinct which identifies freedom with the power to frame purposes and to execute or carry into effect purposes so framed.” Freedom of movement (that is, freedom from constraints) is a necessary, but on a necessary, condition for this fuller sense of freedom. Furthermore, this freedom of intelligence results not from living in isolation of in rejecting social constraints (or, in his wording, “social controls”). In fact, social controls are quite natural and self-directed, Dewey claims. For example, he says, watch children at play. One of the first things they will do is to establish rules and parameters for play, in order to make play possible. Games involve rules, which constrain action, but at the same time make meaningful action possible. The important point here is that these rules are not only accepted, but most often self-imposed by the children at play. In addition to being natural, freedom of intelligence, which incorporates social controls, is social in its nascence. For Dewey: “Liberty is that secure release and fulfillment of personal potentialities which take place only in rich and manifold association with others; the power to be an individualized self making a distinctive contribution and enjoying in its own way the fruits of association.”

d. Other Pragmatists

Besides the “Big Three” classical pragmatists, there were many other important thinkers labeled (sometimes self-identified) as pragmatist. George Herbert Mead (1863-1931) was particularly influential during the first several decades of the twentieth century, especially in his work on the social development of the self and of language. A generation later, Clarence Irving Lewis (1883-1964) wrote several significant works in the middle third of the twentieth century on what he termed “conceptualistic pragmatism,” stressing how pragmatic grounds shape the interpretation of experience. His contemporary, Alain Locke (1885-1954), blending the thought of earlier pragmatists with that of W.E.B. DuBois (1868-1963), produced a large body of work on the social construction of identity (particularly focusing on race) and advocating cultural pluralism within the context of what he called a philosophy of “critical relativism” or “critical pragmatism.”

Another important thinker, often labeled as pragmatist, but noted more for advocating an explicit version of philosophical idealism, was Josiah Royce (1855-1916). Though there were other American idealists (e.g., G. H. Howison of the St. Louis Hegelians and Bordon Parker Bowne (1847-1910), known for his view of “personalism”), Royce is recognized as the most influential of them. Epistemologically, Royce noted that any analysis of experience shows that the fact and, indeed, very possibility of error leads to the postulation of both mind and external reality, since only minds can be in error and being in error presupposes something about which mind can be mistaken. The recognition of error presupposes a higher level of awareness, since knowing that one is in error about X presupposes that one recognize both X and what is mistaken about one’s judgment. Error, then, presupposes some form or level of veridicality. Much like the story of the blind men who come upon an elephant, each believing that part of the elephant captures the whole, the message here is that error is really partiality, that is having only partial truth. For Royce, this also pointed to the ultimate communal nature of all interpretation, as knowledge (even of one’s self) comes from signs, which in turn require some kind of comparison and finally of community. Royce extended this view, and displayed definite affinities to pragmatism, in his analysis of meaning. The meaning of an idea, he claimed, contained both an external and an internal element, much as we say that terms have both a denotation and a connotation. Ideas have external meaning in the sense that they connect up to an external world. But they have an internal meaning in the sense that they embody or express purpose. What is real, Royce claimed, is “the complete embodiment in individual form and in final fulfillment, of the internal meaning of finite ideas.” As these in turn require comparison and moving beyond partiality, they come finally to a complete and coherent absolute level of ideas, what he termed “Absolute Pragmatism.”

4. 20th Century and Recent

Much of the philosophical work of the classic pragmatists, as well as that of Royce and others, though begun in the latter half of the nineteenth century, carried over into the early decades of the twentieth century. While pragmatism continued to be a dominant movement in American philosophy in these early decades, other movements and schools of thought emerged. In the first several decades, there was a revival of common sense realism and naturalism (or, put another way, an explicit rejection of what was seen as the idealism of Royce and some aspects of pragmatism) as well as the emergence of Process Philosophy, which was directly influenced by contemporary science, especially Einsteinian relativity theory. Mid-twentieth century philosophy was heavily dominated in America by empiricism and analytic philosophy, with a strong focus on language. Finally, in the latter couple of decades there was a re-discovery and revival of pragmatism as well as the emergence of feminist and “minority” issues and concerns, of people and groups who had been marginalized and under-represented throughout the nation’s history. Some movements and schools of thought that had been prominent in Europe, such as existentialism and phenomenology, though having advocates in America, never gained significant widespread attention in American philosophy.

One of the earliest movements in twentieth century American thought was a rejection of idealism, spearheaded in large part by Royce’s own student, George Santayana (1863-1952), who saw philosophy as having unfortunately abandoned, and in the case of idealism contradicted, common sense. If we push the concept of knowledge to the point of requiring indubitability, then skepticism is the result, since nothing will satisfy this requirement. On the other hand, if knowledge is a kind of faith, much as common sense rests on untested assumptions, then we are led to a view of “animal faith,” which Santayana endorses. This return to common sense, or at least to a naturalist, realist stance was echoed by many philosophers at this time. In 1910 an essay in the Journal of Philosophy (then called the Journal of Philosophy, Psychology, and Scientific Methods), entitled, “The Program and First Platform of Six Realists,” announced a strong reaction against idealism and what were seen idealist elements in pragmatism. Among the platform planks of this program were statements that objects exist independently of mind, that ontology is logically independent of epistemology, that epistemology is not logically fundamental (that is, that things are known directly to us), that the degree of unity, consistency, or connection subsisting among entities is a matter to be empirically ascertained, etc. Given this realist stance, these philosophers then proceeded to try to produce naturalistic accounts of philosophical matters, for example, Ralph Barton Perry’s (1876-1957) General Theory of Value.

A second school of thought early in the century was known as “Process Philosophy.” Identified largely with the work of Alfred North Whitehead (1861-1947), though having other notable proponents such as Charles Hartshorne (1897-2000), process philosophy proceeded from an ontology that took events or processes as primary. Change and becoming were emphasized over permanence and being. Drawing on contemporary scientific advances, in particular the new Einsteinian worldview, Whitehead highlighted this “event ontology.” In his well-known work, The Concept of Nature, he insisted that “nature is a structure of events,” and taking the new Einsteinian four-dimensional understanding of the world, things (what he called “concresences”) are merely those streams of events “which maintain permanence of character.” This embracing of contemporary science did not entail a materialist stance for Whitehead any more than Jonathan Edwards’s embracing of the Newtonian worldview entailed materialism on his part. Rather, Whitehead distinguished between the notion of “Nature lifeless” and “Nature alive,” with the latter an acknowledgement of value and purpose being just as basic to experience as an external world of events.

Despite the presence of these two movements and the still-present influence of pragmatism, the middle half of the twentieth century was dominated in America by empiricism and analytic philosophy, with a pronounced turn toward linguistic analysis. Beginning with the powerful influence of the Logical Positivists (or Logical Empiricists), most notably Rudolf Carnap (1891-1969), academic philosophy turned in a decided way away from social and political concerns to conceptual analysis and self-reflection (that is, to the question of just what the proper role of philosophy is). Without a doubt, the most influential American philosopher during this time was Willard Van Orman Quine (1908-2000). Though Quine was critical of many aspects of Logical Positivism, indeed, one of his most renowned essays was “Two Dogmas of Empiricism,” he nevertheless shared their view that the role of philosophy was not to enlighten persons or serve social and political concerns. Saying that philosophers in the professional sense have no particular fitness for inspiration or “helping to get society on an even keel,” he argued instead that philosophy’s job is to clear away conceptual muddles and mistakes. Seeing philosophy as in large part continuous with science in the sense of trying to understand what there is and how we can then flourish in the world, he claimed that philosophy is on the abstract, theoretical end of scientific pursuits. Advocating a physicalist ontology, Quine was openly behaviorist about understanding human agency and knowledge. Criticizing the analytic/synthetic distinction and the view that there are truths independent of facts about the world, Quine strongly advocated a naturalized epistemology and naturalized ethics. Openly acknowledging an affinity with some aspects of pragmatism, Quine claimed a holistic approach to knowledge, insisting that no particular experiences occur in isolation; rather we experience a “web of belief,” with every belief or statement or experience affecting “the field as a whole,” and hence “our statements about the external world face the tribunal of sense experience not individually but only as a corporate body.” Reminiscent of Dewey, Quine asserted that while there is no fact/value dichotomy, the sciences, with their system of checks and balances, do provide the best theories and models of what there is. Besides his commitment to materialism, behaviorism, and holism, Quine urged what he called “semantic ascent,” that is, that philosophy should proceed by focusing on an analysis of language. By looking at the language we use and by framing philosophical concerns in terms of language, we can avoid fruitless philosophical disputes and faulty ontological commitments. Within academic philosophy, Quine is perhaps best known for his work in formal, mathematical logic and with his doctrine of “the indeterminacy of translation.” In his highly influential book, Word and Object, he introduced the term “gavagai.” “Gavagai” is a term uttered by a native while pointing at something in the immediate environment, something that appears to us as a rabbit. However, from that utterance, we don’t know if “gavagai” should be translated into English as “rabbit” or “undetached rabbit parts” or “rabbit time-slice” or something else. The point is that there is no givenness to the situation, no determinateness of translation. Nor is this a simple matter, as this lack of givenness and determinacy holds in all situations. There are other, pragmatic, factors that allow communication and understanding to be possible.

With this formal, often extremely technical, conceptual analysis dominating mid-century American philosophy, a return to social and political concerns did not become mainstream again until the 1970s. Such a return is often credited to the publication of John Rawls’s (1921-2002) A Theory of Justice. While other philosophers had, of course, written on these issues, it was Rawls’s book that brought these topics back into mainstream consideration among professional philosophers. Rawls argued for a position of political liberalism based on a system of procedural justice. Though his work was widely influential, it was critiqued by philosophers identified as libertarian, such as Robert Nozick (1938-2002), who saw it as too restrictive of individual liberties, as well as by communitarians, such as Alasdair MacIntyre (1929- ) who saw it as focusing too much on procedural justice and not enough on what is good for persons, who are also citizens situated in communities. Still, the revival of substantive social and political philosophy was effected. Outside of academic philosophy, these concerns had not been absent, however, but were present in the writings of social and political leaders, and in popular political philosophy, such as the writings of Ayn Rand (1905-1982) and Martin Luther King, Jr. (1929-1968).

As the century ended, there was a renewal of interest in pragmatism as a philosophical movement, with two important philosophers in particular adopting the label of pragmatist, Hilary Putnam (1926- ) and Richard Rorty (1931- ). Known throughout the philosophical world, they brought the writings and stance of classical pragmatists back into the forefront of professional philosophy, often with their critiques of each other’s works. This renewal of pragmatism, along with the revival of social and political philosophy, came at the same time, the final quarter of the century, as feminist philosophy emerged, though there had been prominent feminist thinkers in American philosophy prior to this time, e.g., Grimké and Stanton, noted earlier, as well as others, such as Charlotte Perkins Gilman (1860-1935) or even Anne Hutchinson (1591-1643). Outside of academic philosophy, the publication, in the 1960s, of Betty Friedan’s The Feminine Mystique, struck a popular nerve about the marginalization of women. Inside academic philosophy, feminist philosophers, such as Adrienne Rich (1929- ) and many others, began critiques of traditional philosophical concerns and stances. These critiques were leveled at the very roots of philosophical issues and across the board. For example, there were critiques of epistemic values such as objectivity (that is, detached, disembodied inquiry), as well as what were taken as masculine approaches to ethics and political philosophy, such as procedural over substantive justice or rights-based ethical theories. Insisting that there was not a public/private dichotomy and no value-neutral inquiry, feminists reformulated philosophical issues and concerns and redirected philosophical attention to issues of power and the social dimensions (and construction) of those very issues and concerns. This demand for pluralism in content was expanded to philosophical methods and goals, generally, and was expanded to other traditionally marginalized perspectives. By century’s end, traditional philosophical work continued in full force, for example, with a strong surge of interest in philosophy of mind, philosophy of science, etc., but was accompanied at the same time by a sharp increase in these newly-demanded foci, such as philosophy of race, philosophy of law, philosophy of power, etc.

One final note. This survey of American Philosophy clearly is all-too-brief. One difficulty with summarizing American Philosophy is what has counted as philosophy over time. Unlike European cultures, there has tended to be less of an academic class in America, hence less of a sense of professional philosophy, until, that is, the twentieth century. Even then, much of what has been taken as philosophy by most Americans has been distant from what most professional philosophers have taken as philosophy. The kind of public awareness in France and indeed Europe as a whole of, say, the death of Jean-Paul Sartre, was nowhere near matched in America by the death of Quine, though for professional philosophers the latter was at least of equal stature. Few American philosophers have had the social impact outside of academia as John Dewey. A second difficulty here is that many thinkers in American intellectual history lie outside what is today considered philosophy. Because of his intellectual lineage, Jonathan Edwards is still studied within American Philosophy, but other important American thinkers, such as Reinhold Niebuhr (1892-1971) and C. Wright Mills (1916-1962) are not. Much as other academic disciplines, philosophy in America has become professionalized. Nevertheless, professional philosophers, for example in their analysis of rights and the question of the meaningfulness of animal rights, or in their application of philosophical ethics to health care contexts, have both reflected and shaped the face of American culture.

5. References and Further Reading

There are numerous works available on particular American philosophers and specific movements or philosophical traditions in American philosophy. The references below are for books that deal widely with American Philosophy as a whole.

  • Blau, Joseph L. Men and Movements in American Philosophy. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall, 1952.
  • Borradori, Giovanna. The American Philosopher. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1994.
  • Cohen, Morris. American Thought. Glencoe, IL: The Free Press, 1954.
  • Fisch, Max H. (ed.). Classic American Philosophers. New York: Appelton-Century-Crofts, 1951.
  • Flower, Elizabeth and Murray G. Murphy. A History of Philosophy in American, two volumes. New York: G. P. Putnam’s Sons, 1977.
  • Hollinger, David A. and Charles Capper. The American Intellectual Tradition, two volumes. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989. (Second edition, 1993.)
  • Harris, Leonard. Philosophy Born of Struggle: Anthology of African American Philosophy from 1917. Dubuque, IO: Kendell/Hunt, 1983.
  • Harris, Leonard, Scott L. Pratt, and Anne S. Waters (eds.). American Philosophies. Oxford: Blackwell, 2002.
  • Kuklick, Bruce. A History of Philosophy in American, 1720-2000. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2001.
  • Kuklick, Bruce. The Rise of American Philosophy: Cambridge, Massachusetts, 1860-1930. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1977.
  • MacKinnon, Barbara (ed.). American Philosophy: A Historical Anthology. Albany: SUNY Press, 1985.
  • Muelder, Walter G., Laurence Sears and Anne V. Schlabach (eds.). The Develolpment of American Philosophy. New York: Houghton Mifflin, 1940. (Second edition, 1960.)
  • Myers, Gerald (ed.). The Spirit of American Philosophy. New York: Capricorn Books, 1971.
  • Pratt, Scott L. Native Pragmatism. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2002.
  • Reck, Andrew J. The New American Philosophers. New York: Dell, 1968.
  • Reck, Andrew J. Recent American Philosophy. New York: Pantheon Books, 1964.
  • Schneider, Herbert W. A History of American Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1946.
  • Singer, Marcus G. (ed.) American Philosophy. Cambridge: Royal Institute of Philosophy, 1985.
  • Smith, John E. The Spirit of American Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press, 1963.
  • Smith, John E. Themes in American Philosophy. New York: Harper & Row, 1970.
  • Stanlick, Nancy A. and Bruce S. Silver (eds.). Philosophy in America: Primary Readings. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson Prentice Hall, 2004.
  • Stroh, Guy W. American Philosophy. Princeton: D. Van Nostrand, 1968.
  • Stuhr, John J. (ed.). Classical American Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1987.
  • Stuhr, John J. (ed.). Pragmatism and Classical American Philosophy, second edition. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Waters, Anne S. American Indian Thought. Oxford: Blackwell, 2003.
  • West, Cornell. The American Evasion of Philosophy. Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1989.
  • White, Morton (ed.). Documents in the History of American Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press, 1972.
  • White, Morton. Science and Sentiment in America. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1972.
  • Winn, Ralph B. (ed.). American Philosophy. New York: Greenwood Press, 1968.

Author Information

David Boersema
Pacific University
U. S. A.

Last updated: July 21, 2005 | Originally published: