The school of analytic philosophy has dominated academic philosophy in various regions, most notably Great Britain and the United States, since the early twentieth century. It originated around the turn of the twentieth century as G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell broke away from what was then the dominant school in the British universities, Absolute Idealism. Many would also include Gottlob Frege as a founder of analytic philosophy in the late 19th century, and this controversial issue is discussed in section 2c. When Moore and Russell articulated their alternative to Idealism, they used a linguistic idiom, frequently basing their arguments on the “meanings” of terms and propositions. Additionally, Russell believed that the grammar of natural language often is philosophically misleading, and that the way to dispel the illusion is to re-express propositions in the ideal formal language of symbolic logic, thereby revealing their true logical form. Because of this emphasis on language, analytic philosophy was widely, though perhaps mistakenly, taken to involve a turn toward language as the subject matter of philosophy, and it was taken to involve an accompanying methodological turn toward linguistic analysis. Thus, on the traditional view, analytic philosophy was born in this linguistic turn. The linguistic conception of philosophy was rightly seen as novel in the history of philosophy. For this reason analytic philosophy is reputed to have originated in a philosophical revolution on the grand scale—not merely in a revolt against British Idealism, but against traditional philosophy on the whole.
Analytic philosophy underwent several internal micro-revolutions that divide its history into five phases. The first phase runs approximately from 1900 to 1910. It is characterized by the quasi-Platonic form of realism initially endorsed by Moore and Russell as an alternative to Idealism. Their realism was expressed and defended in the idiom of “propositions” and “meanings,” so it was taken to involve a turn toward language. But its other significant feature is its turn away from the method of doing philosophy by proposing grand systems or broad syntheses and its turn toward the method of offering narrowly focused discussions that probe a specific, isolated issue with precision and attention to detail. By 1910, both Moore and Russell had abandoned their propositional realism—Moore in favor of a realistic philosophy of common sense, Russell in favor of a view he developed with Ludwig Wittgenstein called logical atomism. The turn to logical atomism and to ideal-language analysis characterizes the second phase of analytic philosophy, approximately 1910-1930. The third phase, approximately 1930-1945, is characterized by the rise of logical positivism, a view developed by the members of the Vienna Circle and popularized by the British philosopher A. J. Ayer. The fourth phase, approximately 1945-1965, is characterized by the turn to ordinary-language analysis, developed in various ways by the Cambridge philosophers Ludwig Wittgenstein and John Wisdom, and the Oxford philosophers Gilbert Ryle, John Austin, Peter Strawson, and Paul Grice.
During the 1960s, criticism from within and without caused the analytic movement to abandon its linguistic form. Linguistic philosophy gave way to the philosophy of language, the philosophy of language gave way to metaphysics, and this gave way to a variety of philosophical sub-disciplines. Thus the fifth phase, beginning in the mid 1960s and continuing beyond the end of the twentieth century, is characterized by eclecticism or pluralism. This post-linguistic analytic philosophy cannot be defined in terms of a common set of philosophical views or interests, but it can be loosely characterized in terms of its style, which tends to emphasize precision and thoroughness about a narrow topic and to deemphasize the imprecise or cavalier discussion of broad topics.
Even in its earlier phases, analytic philosophy was difficult to define in terms of its intrinsic features or fundamental philosophical commitments. Consequently, it has always relied on contrasts with other approaches to philosophy—especially approaches to which it found itself fundamentally opposed—to help clarify its own nature. Initially, it was opposed to British Idealism, and then to “traditional philosophy” at large. Later, it found itself opposed both to classical Phenomenology (for example, Husserl) and its offspring, such as Existentialism (Sartre, Camus, and so forth) and also “Continental”’ or “Postmodern” philosophy (Heidegger, Foucault and Derrida). Though classical Pragmatism bears some similarity to early analytic philosophy, especially in the work of C. S. Peirce and C. I. Lewis, the pragmatists are usually understood as constituting a separate tradition or school.
“It was towards the end of 1898,” wrote Bertrand Russell,
that Moore and I rebelled against both Kant and Hegel. Moore led the way, but I followed closely in his footsteps…. I felt…a great liberation, as if I had escaped from a hot house onto a windswept headland. In the first exuberance of liberation, I became a naïve realist and rejoiced in the thought that grass really is green. (Russell 1959, 22)
This important event in Russell’s own intellectual history turned out to be decisive for the history of twentieth-century philosophy as a whole; for it was this revolutionary break with British Idealism—then the most influential school of philosophical thought in the British universities—that birthed analytic philosophy and set it on the path to supplanting both Idealism and philosophy as traditionally conceived and practiced.
To understand Russell’s elation at the rebellion, one needs to know something about him and also something about British Idealism. Let’s begin with the latter.
At the end of the 19th century, F.H. Bradley, Bernard Bosanquet, and J.M.E. McTaggart were the leading British Idealists. They claimed that the world, although it naively appears to us to be a collection of discrete objects (this bird, that table, the earth and the sun, and so forth), is really a single indivisible whole whose nature is mental, or spiritual, or Ideal rather than material. Thus, idealism was a brand of metaphysical monism, but not a form of materialism, the other leading form of metaphysical monism. It was also a form of what we would now call anti-realism, since it claimed that the world of naïve or ordinary experience is something of an illusion. Their claim was not that the objects of ordinary experience do not exist, but that they are not, as we normally take them to be, discrete. Instead, every object exists and is what it is at least partly in virtue of the relations it bears to other things—more precisely, to all other things. This was called the doctrine of internal relations. Since, on this view, everything that exists does so only in virtue of its relations to everything else, it is misleading to say of any one thing that it exists simpliciter. The only thing that exists simpliciter is the whole—the entire network of necessarily related objects. Correspondingly, the Idealists believed that no statement about some isolated object could be true simpliciter, since, on their view, to speak of an object in isolation would be to ignore the greater part of the truth about it, namely, its relations to everything else.
Analytic philosophy began when Moore and then Russell started to defend a thoroughgoing realism about what Moore called the “common sense” or “ordinary” view of the world. This involved a lush metaphysical pluralism, the belief that there are many things that exist simpliciter. It was not this pluralism, however, nor the content of any of his philosophical views, that inspired the analytic movement. Instead, it was the manner and idiom of Moore’s philosophizing. First, Moore rejected system-building or making grand syntheses of his views, preferring to focus on narrowly defined philosophical problems held in isolation. Second, when Moore articulated his realism, he did so in the idiom of “propositions” and “meanings.” There is a noteworthy ambiguity as to whether these are linguistic items or mental ones.
This terminology is further ambiguous in Moore’s case, for two reasons. First, his views about propositions are highly similar to a view standard in Austro-German philosophy from Bolzano and Lotze to Husserl according to which “propositions” and “meanings” have an Ideal existence—the kind of existence traditionally attributed to Platonic Forms. It is likely that Moore got the idea from reading in that tradition (cf. Bell 1999, Willard 1984). Second, despite strong similarities with the Austro-German view, it is clear that, in Moore’s early thought, “propositions” and “meanings” are primarily neither Ideal nor mental nor linguistic, but real in the sense of “thing-like.” For Moore and the early Russell, propositions or meanings were “identical” to ordinary objects—tables, cats, people. For more on this peculiar view, see the article on Moore, section 2b.
The deep metaphysical complexity attaching to Moore’s view was largely overlooked or ignored by his younger contemporaries, who were attracted to the form of his philosophizing rather than to its content. Taking the linguistic aspect of “propositions” and “meanings” to be paramount, they saw Moore as endorsing a linguistic approach to philosophy. This along with his penchant for attending to isolated philosophical problems rather than constructing a grand system, gave rise to the notion that he had rebelled not merely against British Idealism but against traditional philosophy on the grand scale.
Though Moore was later to object that there was nothing especially linguistic about it (see Moore 1942b), the linguistic conception of Moore’s method was far from baseless. For instance, in a famous paper called “A Defense of Common Sense” (Moore 1925), Moore seems to argue that the common sense view of the world is built into the terms of our ordinary language, so that if some philosopher wants to say that some common sense belief is false, he thereby disqualifies the very medium in which he expresses himself, and so speaks either equivocally or nonsensically.
His case begins with the observation that we know many things despite the fact that we do not know how we know them. Among these “beliefs of common sense,” as he calls them, are such propositions as “There exists at present a living human body, which is my body,” “Ever since it [this body] was born, it has been either in contact with or not far from the surface of the earth,” and “I have often perceived both body and other things which formed part of its environment, including other human bodies” (Moore 1925; in Moore 1959: 33). We can call these common sense propositions.
Moore argues that each common sense proposition has an “ordinary meaning” that specifies exactly what it is that one knows when one knows that proposition to be true. This “ordinary meaning” is perfectly clear to most everyone, except for some skeptical philosophers who
seem to think that [for example] the question “Do you believe that the earth has existed for many years past?” is not a plain question, such as should be met either by a plain “Yes” or “No,” or by a plain “I can’t make up my mind,” but is the sort of question which can be properly met by: “It all depends on what you mean by ‘the earth’ and ‘exists’ and ‘years’….” (Moore 1925; in 1959: 36)
Moore thought that to call common sense into question this way is perverse because the ordinary meaning of a common sense proposition is plain to all competent language-users. So, to question its meaning, and to suggest it has a different meaning, is disingenuous. Moreover, since the bounds of intelligibility seem to be fixed by the ordinary meanings of common sense proposition, the philosopher must accept them as starting points for philosophical reflection. Thus, the task of the philosopher is not to question the truth of common sense propositions, but to provide their correct analyses or explanations.
Moore’s use of the term “analysis” in this way is the source of the name “analytic philosophy.” Early on in analytic history, Moorean analysis was taken to be a matter of rephrasing some common sense proposition so as to yield greater insight into its already-clear and unquestionable meaning. For example, just as one elucidates the meaning of “brother” by saying a brother is a male sibling or by saying it means “male sibling,” so one might say that seeing a hand means experiencing a certain external object—which is exactly what Moore claims in his paper “Proof of an External World” (Moore 1939).
The argument of that essay runs as follows. “Here is one hand” is a common sense proposition with an ordinary meaning. Using it in accordance with that meaning, presenting the hand for inspection is sufficient proof that the proposition is true—that there is indeed a hand there. But a hand, according to the ordinary meaning of “hand,” is a material object, and a material object, according to the ordinary meaning of “material object,” is an external object, an object that isn’t just in our mind. Thus, since we can prove that there is a hand there, and since a hand is an external object, there is an external world, according to the ordinary meaning of “external world.”
These examples are from papers written in the second half of Moore’s career, but his “linguistic method” can be discerned much earlier, in works dating all the way back to the late 1800s—the period of his rebellion against Idealism. Even in Moore’s first influential paper, “The Nature of Judgment” (Moore 1899), he can be found paying very close attention to propositions and their meanings. In his celebrated paper, “The Refutation of Idealism” (Moore 1903b), Moore uses linguistic analysis to argue against the Idealist’s slogan Esse est percipi (to be is to be perceived). Moore reads the slogan as a definition or, as he would later call it, an analysis: just as we say “bachelor” means “unmarried man,” so the Idealist says “to exist” means “to be cognized.” However, if these bits of language had the same meaning, Moore argues, it would be superfluous to assert that they were identical, just as it is superfluous to say “a bachelor is a bachelor.” The fact that the Idealist sees some need to assert the formula reveals that there is a difference in meanings of “to be” and “to be perceived,” and hence a difference in the corresponding phenomena as well.
Moore’s most famous meaning-centered argument is perhaps the “open question argument” of his Principia Ethica (Moore 1903a). The open question argument purports to show that it is a mistake to define “good” in terms of anything other than itself. For any definition of good—“goodness is pleasure,” say—it makes sense to ask whether goodness really is pleasure (or whatever it has been identified with); thus, every attempt at definition leaves it an open question as to what good really is. This is so because every purported definition fails to capture the meaning of “good.”
All of these cases exhibit what proved to be the most influential aspect of Moore’s philosophical work, namely his method of analysis, which many of his contemporaries took to be linguistic analysis. For instance, Norman Malcolm represents the standard view of Moore for much of the twentieth century when he says that “the essence of Moore’s technique of refuting philosophical statements consists in pointing out that these statements go against ordinary language” (Malcolm 1942, 349). In the same essay, he goes on to tie Moore’s entire philosophical legacy to his “linguistic method:”
Moore’s great historical role consists in the fact that he has been perhaps the first philosopher to sense that any philosophical statement that violates ordinary language is false, and consistently to defend ordinary language against its philosophical violators. (Malcolm 1942, 368)
Malcolm is right to note the novelty of Moore’s approach. Although previous philosophers occasionally had philosophized about language, and had, in their philosophizing, paid close attention to the way language was used, none had ever claimed that philosophizing itself was merely a matter of analyzing language. Of course, Moore did not make this claim either, but what Moore actually did as a philosopher seemed to make saying it superfluous—in practice, he seemed to be doing exactly what Malcolm said he was doing. Thus, though it took some time for the philosophical community to realize it, it eventually became clear that this new “linguistic method,” pioneered by Moore, constituted a radical break not only with the British Idealists but with the larger philosophical tradition itself. To put it generally, philosophy was traditionally understood as the practice of reasoning about the world. Its goal was to give a logos—a rationally coherent account—of the world and its parts at various levels of granularity, but ultimately as a whole and at the most general level. There were other aspects of the project, too, of course, but this was the heart of it. With Moore, however, philosophy seemed to be recast as the practice of linguistic analysis applied to isolated issues. Thus, the rise of analytic philosophy, understood as the relatively continuous growth of a new philosophical school originating in Moore’s “linguistic turn,” was eventually recognized as being not just the emergence of another philosophical school, but as constituting a “revolution in philosophy” at large. (See Ayer et al. 1963 and Tugendhat 1982.)
The second phase of analytic philosophy is charaterized by the turn to ideal language analysis and, along with it, logical atomism—a metaphysical system developed by Bertrand Russell and Ludwig Wittgenstein. Russell laid the essential groundwork for both in his pioneering work in formal logic, which is covered in Sections 2a and 2b. Though this work was done during the first phase of analytic philosophy (1900-1910), it colaesced into a system only toward the end of that period, as Russell and Whitehead completed their work on the monumental Principia Mathematica (Russell and Whitehead 1910-13), and as Russell began to work closely with Ludwig Wittgenstein.
Wittgenstein seems to have been the sine qua non of the system. Russell was the first to use the term “logical atomism,” in a 1911 lecture to the French Philosophical Society. He was also the first to publicly provide a full-length, systematic treatment of it, in his 1918 lectures on “The Philosophy of Logical Atomism” (Russell 1918-19). However, despite the centrality of Russell’s logical work for the system, in the opening paragraph of these lectures Russell acknowedges that they “are very largely concerned with explaining certain ideas which I learnt from my friend and former pupil Ludwig Wittgenstein” (Russell 1918, 35). Wittgenstein’s own views are recorded in his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. First published in 1921, the Tractatus proved to be the most influential piece written on logical atomism. Because of its influence, we shall pay special attention to the Tractatus when it comes to presenting logical atomism as a complete system in Section 2d.
Though Russell and Wittgenstein differed over some of the details of logical atomism, these disagreements can be ignored for present purposes. What mattered for the development of analytic philosophy on the whole was the emergence in the second decade of the twentieth century of a new view of reality tailored to fit recent developments in formal logic and the philosophical methodology connected to it, as discussed in Section 2b. This was the common core of the Russellian and Wittegensteinian versions of logical atomism; thus, blurring the lines between Russell and Wittgenstein actually enables us to maintain better focus on the emerging analytic tradition. It will also make convenient a brief word on Frege, to see why some have wanted to include him as a founder of analytic philosophy (Section 2c).
Much of Russell’s exuberance over Moore’s realism had to do with its consequences for logic and mathematics. Like so many philosophers before him, Russell was attracted to the objective certainty of mathematical and logical truths. However, because Idealism taught that no proposition about a bit of reality in isolation could be true simpliciter, an apparently straightforward truth such as 2+2=4, or If a=b and b=c then a=c, was not so straightforward after all. Even worse, Idealism made such truths dependent upon their being thought or conceived. This follows from the doctrine of internal relations; for, on the natural assumption that knowledge is or involves a relation between a knower (subject) and something known (object), the doctrine implies that objects of knowledge are not independent of the subjects that know them. This left Idealism open to the charge of endorsing psychologism—the view that apparently objective truths are to be accounted for in terms of the operations of subjective cognitive or “psychological” faculties. Psychologism was common to nearly all versions of Kantian and post-Kantian Idealism (including British Idealism). It was also a common feature of thought in the British empirical tradition, from Hume to Mill (albeit with a naturalistic twist). Moore’s early realism allowed Russell to avoid psychologism and other aspects of Idealism that prevented treating logical and mathematical truths as absolutely true in themselves.
A crucial part of this early realism, however, was the object theory of meaning; and this had implications that Russell found unacceptable. On the object theory, the meaning of a sentence is the object or state of affairs to which it refers (this is one reason why Moore could identify ordinary objects as propositions or meanings; see Section 1). For instance, the sentence “That leaf is green” is meaningful in virtue of bearing a special relationship to the state of affairs it is about, namely, a certain leaf’s being green.
This may seem plausible at first glance; problems emerge, however, when one recognizes that the class of meaningful sentences includes many that, from an empirical point of view, lack objects. Any statement referring to something that does not exist, such as a fictional character in a novel, will have this problem. A particularly interesting species of this genus is the negative existential statement—statements that express the denial of their subjects’ existence. For example, when we say “The golden mountain does not exist,” we seem to refer to a golden mountain—a nonexistent object—in the very act of denying its existence. But, on the object theory, if this sentence is to be meaningful, it must have an object to serve as its meaning. Thus it seems that the object theorist is faced with a dilemma: either give-up the object theory of meaning or postulate a realm of non-empirical objects that stand as the meanings of these apparently objectless sentences.
The Austrian philosopher Alexius Meinong took the latter horn of the dilemma, notoriously postulating a realm of non-existent objects. This alternative was too much for Russell. Instead, he found a way of going between the horns of the dilemma. His escape route was called the “theory of descriptions,” a bit of creative reasoning that the logician F. P. Ramsey called a “paradigm of philosophy,” and one which helped to stimulate extraordinary social momentum for the budding analytic movement. The theory of descriptions appears in Russell’s 1905 essay, “On Denoting,” which has become a central text in the analytic canon. There, Russell argues that “denoting phrases”—phrases that involve a noun preceded by “a,” “an,” “some,” “any,” “every,” “all,” or “the”—are incomplete symbols; that is, they have no meaning on their own, but only in the context of a complete sentence that expresses a proposition. Such sentences can be rephrased—analyzed in Moore’s sense of “analyzed”—into sentences that are meaningful and yet do not refer to anything nonexistent.
For instance, according to Russell, saying “The golden mountain does not exist” is really just a misleading way of saying “It is not the case that there is exactly one thing that is a mountain and is golden.” Thus analyzed, it becomes clear that the proposition does not refer to anything, but simply denies an existential claim. Since it does not refer to any “golden mountain,” it does not need a Meinongian object to provide it with meaning. In fact, taking the latter formulation to be the true logical form of the statement, Russell construes the original’s reference to a non-existent golden mountain as a matter of grammatical illusion. One dispels the illusion by making the grammatical form match the true logical form, and this is done through logical analysis. The idea that language could cast illusions that needed to be dispelled, some form of linguistic analysis was to be a prominent theme in analytic philosophy, both in its ideal language and ordinary language camps, through roughly 1960.
Russellian analysis has just been just identified as logical rather than linguistic analysis, and yet it was said in a previous paragraph that this was analysis in the sense made familiar by Moore. In truth, there were both significant similarities and significant differences between Moorean and Russellian analysis. On the one hand, Russellian analysis was like Moore’s in that it involved the rephrasing of a sentence into another sentence semantically equivalent but grammatically different. On the other hand, Russell’s analyses were not given in ordinary language, as Moore’s were. Instead, they were given in symbolic logic, that is, in a quasi-mathematical, symbolic notation that made the structure of Russell’s analyzed propositions exceedingly clear. For instance, with the definitions of Mx as “x is a mountain” and Gx as “x is golden,” the proposition that the golden mountain does not exist becomes
~[(∃x)(Mx & Gx) & ∀y((My & Gy) → y=x)]
Equivalently, in English, it is not the case that there is some object such that (1) it is a mountain, (2) it is golden, and (3) all objects that are mountains and golden are identical to it. (For more on what this sort of notation looks like and how it works, see the article on Propositional Logic, especially Section 3.)
By 1910, Russell, along with Alfred North Whitehead, had so developed this symbolic notation and the rules governing its use that it constituted a fairly complete system of formal logic. This they published in the three volumes of their monumental Principia Mathematica (Russell and Whitehead 1910-1913).
Within the analytic movement, the Principia was received as providing an ideal language, capable of elucidating all sorts of ordinary-language confusions. Consequently, Russellian logical analysis was seen as a new species of the genus linguistic analysis, which had already been established by Moore. Furthermore, many took logical analysis to be superior to Moore’s ordinary-language analysis insofar as its results (its analyses) were more exact and not themselves prone to further misunderstandings or illusions.
The distinction between ordinary-language philosophy and ideal-language philosophy formed the basis for a fundamental division within the analytic movement through the early 1960s. The introduction of logical analysis also laid the groundwork for logical atomism, a new metaphysical system developed by Russell and Ludwig Wittgenstein. Before we discuss this directly, however, we must say a word about Gottlob Frege.
In developing the formal system of Principia Mathematica, Russell relied heavily on the work of several forebears including the German mathematician and philosopher Gottlob Frege. A generation before Russell and the Principia, Frege had provided his own system of formal logic, with its own system of symbolic notation. Frege’s goal in doing so was to prove logicism, the view that mathematics is reducible to logic. This was also Russell’s goal in the Principia. (For more on the development of logic in the late 19th and early 20th centuries, see the article on Propositional Logic, especially Section 2). Frege also anticipated Russell’s notion of incomplete symbols by invoking what has come to be called “the context principle:” words have meaning only in the context of complete sentences.
Frege’s focus on the formalization and symbolization of logic naturally led him into terrain that we would now classify as falling under the philosophy of language, and to approach certain philosophical problems as if they were problems about language, or at least as if they could be resolved by linguistic means. This has led some to see in Frege a linguistic turn similar to that perceivable in the early work of Moore and Russell (on this point, see the article on Frege and Language).
Because of these similarities and anticipations, and because Russell explicitly relied on Frege’s work, many have seen Frege as a founder of analytic philosophy more or less on a par with Moore and Russell (See Dummett 1993 and Kenny 2000). Others see this as an exaggeration both of Frege’s role and of the similarities between him and other canonical analysts. For instance, Peter Hacker notes that Frege was not interested in reforming philosophy the way all the early analysts were:
Frege’s professional life was a single-minded pursuit of a demonstration that arithmetic had its foundations in pure logic alone … One will search Frege’s works in vain for a systematic discussion of the nature of philosophy. (Hacker 1986: 5, 7)
There is no doubt that Frege’s views proved crucially useful and inspiring to key players on the ideal-language side of analytic philosophy. Whether or not this qualifies him as a founder of analytic philosophy depends on the extent to which we see the analytic movement as born of a desire for metaphilosophical revolution on the grand scale. To the extent that this is essential to our understanding of analytic philosophy, Frege’s role will be that of an influence rather than a founder.
Ludwig Wittgenstein came to Cambridge to study mathematical logic under Russell, but he quickly established himself as his teacher’s intellectual peer. Together, they devised a metaphysical system called “logical atomism.” As discussed at the beginning of Section 2, qua total system, logical atomism seems to have been Wittgenstein’s brainchild. Still, this should not be seen as in any way marginalizing Russell’s significance for the system, which can be described as a metaphysics based on the assumption that an ideal language the likes of which was provided in Principia Mathematica is the key to reality.
According to logical atomism, propositions are built out of elements corresponding to the basic constituents of the world, just as sentences are built out of words. The combination of words in a meaningful sentence mirrors the combination of constituents in the corresponding proposition and also in the corresponding possible or actual state of affairs. That is, the structure of every possible or actual state of affairs is isomorphic with both the structure of the proposition that refers to it and the structure of the sentence that expresses that proposition–so long as the sentence is properly formulated in the notation of symbolic logic. The simplest sort of combination is called an atomic fact because this fact has no sub-facts as part of its structure. An atomic fact for some logical atomists might be something like an individual having a property—a certain leaf’s being green, for instance. Linguistically, this fact is represented by an atomic proposition: for example, “this leaf is green,” or, in logical symbolism “F(a).” Both the fact F(a) and the proposition “F(a)” are called “atomic” not because they themselves are atomic [that is, without structure], but because all their constituents are. Atomic facts are the basic constituents of the world, and atomic propositions are the basic constituents of language.
More complex propositions representing more complex facts are called molecular propositions and molecular facts. The propositions are made by linking atomic propositions together with truth-functional connectives, such as “and,” “or” and “not.” A truth-functional connective is one that combines constituent propositions in such a way that their truth-values (that is, their respective statuses as true or false) completely determine the truth value of the resulting molecular proposition. For instance, the truth value of a proposition of the form “not-p” can be characterized in terms of, and hence treated as determined by, the truth value of “p” because if “p” is true, then “not-p” is false, and if it is false, “not-p” is true. Similarly, a proposition of the form “p and q” will be true if and only if its constituent propositions “p” and “q” are true on their own.
The logic of Principia Mathematica is entirely truth-functional; that is, it only allows for molecular propositions whose truth-values are determined by their atomic constituents. Thus, as Russell observed in the introduction to the second edition of the Principia, “given all true atomic propositions, together with the fact that they are all, every other true proposition can theoretically be deduced by logical methods” (Russell 1925, xv). The same assumption—called the thesis of truth-functionality or the thesis of extensionality—lies behind Wittgenstien’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus.
As mentioned previously, Wittgenstein’s Tractatus proved to be the most influential expression of logical atomism. The Tractatus is organized around seven propositions, here taken from the 1922 translation by C. K. Ogden:
The body of the Tractatus consists in cascading levels of numbered elaborations of these propositions (1 is elaborated by 1.1 which is elaborated by 1.11, 1.12 and 1.13, and so forth)—except for 7, which stands on its own. Propositions 1 and 2 establish the metaphysical side of logical atomism: the world is nothing but a complex of atomic facts. Propositions 3 and 4 establish the isomorphism between language and reality: a significant (meaningful) proposition is a “logical picture” of the facts that constitute some possible or actual state of affairs. It is a picture in the sense that the structure of the proposition is identical to the structure of the corresponding atomic facts. It is here, incidentally, that we get the first explicit statement of the metaphilosophical view characteristic of early analytic philosophy: “All philosophy is a ‘critique of language’ …” (4.0031).
Proposition 5 asserts the thesis of truth-functionality, the view that all complex propositions are built out of atomic propositions joined by truth-functional connectives, and that atomic propositions are truth-functional in themselves. Even existentially quantified propositions are considered to be long disjunctions of atomic propositions. It has since been recognized that a truth-functional logic is not adequate to capture all the phenomena of the world; or at least that, if there is an adequate truth-functional system, we haven’t found it yet. Certain phenomena seem to defy truth-functional characterization; for instance, moral facts are problematic. Knowing whether the constituent proposition “p” is true, doesn’t seem to tell us whether “It ought to be the case that p” is true. Similarly problematical are facts about thoughts, beliefs, and other mental states (captured in statements such as “John believes that…”), and modal facts (captured in statements about the necessity or possibility of certain states of affairs). And treating existential quantifiers as long disjunctions doesn’t seem to be adequate for the infinite number of facts about numbers since there surely are more real numbers than there are available names to name them even if we were willing to accept infinitely long disjunctions. The hope that truth-functional logic will prove adequate for resolving all these problems has inspired a good bit of thinking in the analytic tradition, especially during the first half of the twentieth century. This hope lies at the heart of logical atomism.
In its full form, Proposition 6 includes some unusual symbolism that is not reproduced here. All it does, however, is to give a general “recipe” for the creation of molecular propositions by giving the general form of a truth-function. Basically, Wittgenstein is saying that all propositions are truth-functional, and that, ultimately, there is only one kind of truth-function. Principia Mathematica had employed a number of truth-functional connectives: “and,” “or,” “not,” and so forth. However, in 1913 a logician named Henry Sheffer showed that propositions involving these connectives could be rephrased (analyzed) as propositions involving a single connective consisting in the negation of a conjunction. This was called the “not and” or “nand” connective, and was supposed to be equivalent to the ordinary language formulation “not both x and y.” It is usually symbolized by a short vertical line ( | ) called the Sheffer stroke. Though Wittgenstein uses his own idiosyncratic symbolism, this is the operation identified in proposition 6 and some of its elaborations as showing the general form of a truth-function. Replacing the Principia’s plurality of connectives with the “nand” connective made for an extremely minimalistic system—all one needed to construct a complete picture/description of the world was a single truth-functional connective applied repeatedly to the set of all atomic propositions.
Proposition 7, which stands on its own, is the culmination of a series of observations made throughout the Tractatus, and especially in the elaborations of proposition 6. Throughout the Tractatus there runs a distinction between showing and saying. Saying is a matter of expressing a meaningful proposition. Showing is a matter of presenting something’s form or structure. Thus, as Wittgenstein observes at 4.022, “A proposition shows its sense. A proposition shows how things stand if it is true. And it says that they do so stand.”
In the introduction to the Tractatus, Wittgenstein indicates that his overarching purpose is to set the criteria and limits of meaningful saying. The structural aspects of language and the world—those aspects that are shown—fall beyond the limits of meaningful saying. According to Wittgenstein, the propositions of logic and mathematics are purely structural and therefore meaningless—they show the form of all possible propositions/states of affairs, but they do not themselves picture any particular state of affairs, thus they do not say anything. This has the odd consequence that the propositions of the Tractatus themselves, which are supposed to be about logic, are meaningless. Hence the famous dictum at 6.54:
My propositions are elucidatory in this way: he who understands me finally recognizes them as senseless, when he has climbed out through them, on them, over them. (He must so to speak throw away the ladder, after he has climbed up on it.) He must transcend these propositions, and then he will see the world aright.
Though meaningless, the propositions of logic and mathematics are not nonsense. They at least have the virtue of showing the essential structure of all possible facts. On the other hand, there are concatenations of words, purported propositions, that neither show nor say anything and thus are not connected to reality in any way. Such propositions are not merely senseless, they are nonsense. Among nonsense propositions are included the bulk of traditional philosophical statements articulating traditional philosophical problems and solutions, especially in metaphysics and ethics. This is the consequence of Wittgenstein’s presumption that meaningfulness is somehow linked to the realm of phenomena studied by the natural sciences (cf. 4.11 ff). Thus, as he claims in 6.53:
The correct method in philosophy would really be the following: to say nothing except what can be said, that is propositions of natural science—that is something that has nothing to do with philosophy—and then, whenever someone else wanted to say something metaphysical, to demonstrate to him that he had failed to give a meaning to certain signs in his propositions.
In the eyes of its author (as he avers in its Introduction), the real accomplishment of the Tractatus was to have solved, or rather dissolved, all the traditional problems of philosophy by showing that they were meaningless conundrums generated by a failure to understand the limits of meaningful discourse.
Logical positivism is the result of combining the central aspects of the positivisms of Auguste Comte and Ernst Mach with the meta-philosophical and methodological views of the analytic movement, especially as understood by the ideal-language camp. In all its forms, positivism was animated by the idealization of scientific knowledge as it was commonly understood from at least the time of Newton through the early twentieth century. Consequently, at its core is a view called scientism: the view that all knowledge is scientific knowledge.
As twentieth-century philosophy of science has shown, the definition and demarcation of science is a very difficult task. Still, for several centuries it has been common to presume that metaphysics and other branches of philosophy-as-traditionally-practiced, not to mention religious and “common sense” beliefs, do not qualify as scientific. From the standpoint of scientism, these are not fields of knowledge, and their claims should not be regarded as carrying any serious weight.
At the heart of logical positivism was a novel way of dismissing certain non-scientific views by declaring them not merely wrong or false, but meaningless. According to the verification theory of meaning, sometimes also called the empiricist theory of meaning, any non-tautological statement has meaning if and only if it can be empirically verified. This “verification principle” of meaning is similar to the principle maintained in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus that the realm of meaning is coextensive with the realm of the natural (empirical) sciences. In fact the logical positivists drew many of their views straight from the pages of the Tractatus (though their reading of it has since been criticized as being too inclined to emphasize the parts friendly to scientific naturalism at the expense of those less-friendly). With Wittgenstein, the logical positivists concluded that the bulk of traditional philosophy consisted in meaningless pseudo-problems generated by the misuse of language, and that the true role of philosophy was to establish and enforce the limits of meaningful language through linguistic analysis.
Logical positivism was created and promoted mainly by a number of Austro-German thinkers associated with the Vienna Circle and, to a lesser extent, the Berlin Circle. The Vienna Circle began as a discussion group of scientifically-minded philosophers—or perhaps philosophically minded-scientists—organized by Moritz Schlick in 1922. Its exact membership is difficult to determine, since there were a number of peripheral figures who attended its meetings or at least had substantial connections to core members, but who are frequently characterized as visitors or associates rather than full-fledged members. Among its most prominent members were Schlick himself, Otto Neurath, Herbert Feigl, Freidrich Waismann and, perhaps most prominent of all, Rudolph Carnap. The members of both Circles made contributions to a number of different philosophical and scientific discussions, including logic and the philosophy of mind (see for example this Encyclopedia’s articles on Behaviorism and Identity Theory); however, their most important contributions vis-à-vis the development of analytic philosophy were in the areas of the philosophy of language, philosophical methodology and metaphilosophy. It was their views in these areas that combined to form logical positivism.
Logical positivism was popularized in Britain by A.J. Ayer, who visited with the Vienna Circle in 1933. His book Language, Truth and Logic (Ayer 1936) was extremely influential, and remains the best introduction to logical positivism as understood in its heyday. To escape the turmoil of World War II, several members of the Vienna Circle emigrated to the United States where they secured teaching posts and exercised an immense influence on academic philosophy. By this time, however, logical positivism was largely past its prime; consequently, it was not so much logical positivism proper that was promulgated, but something more in the direction of philosophizing focused on language, logic, and science. (For more on this point, see the article on American Philosophy, especially Section 4).
Ironically, the demise of logical positivism was caused mainly by a fatal flaw in its central view, the verification theory of meaning. According to the verification principle, a non-tautological statement has meaning if and only if it can be empirically verified. However, the verification principle itself is non-tautological but cannot be empirically verified. Consequently, it renders itself meaningless. Even apart from this devastating problem, there were difficulties in setting the scope of the principle so as to properly subserve the positivists’ scientistic aims. In its strong form (given above), the principle undermined not only itself, but also statements about theoretical entities, so necessary for science to do its work. On the other hand, weaker versions of the principle, such as that given in the second edition of Ayer’s Language, Truth, and Logic (1946), were incapable of eliminating the full range of metaphysical and other non-scientific statements that the positivists wanted to disqualify.
Willard Van Orman Quine was the first American philosopher of any great significance in the analytic tradition. Though his views had their greatest impact only as the era of linguistic philosophy came to an end, it is convenient to take them up in contrast with logical positivism.
An important part of the logical positivist program was the attempt to analyze or reduce scientific statements into so-called protocol statements having to do with empirical observations. This reductionist project was taken up by several members of the Vienna Circle, but none took it so far as did Rudolph Carnap, in his The Logical Structure of the World (1928) and in subsequent work.
The basic problem for the reductionist project is that many important scientific claims and concepts seem to go beyond what can be verified empirically. Claiming that the sun will come up tomorrow is a claim the goes beyond today’s observations. Claims about theoretical entities such as atoms also provide obvious cases of going beyond what can be verified by specific observations, but statements of scientific law run into essentially the same problem. Assuming empiricism, what is required to place scientific claims on a secure, epistemic foundation is to eliminate the gap between observation and theory without introducing further unverifiable entities or views. This was the goal of the reductionist project. By showing that every apparently unverifiable claim in science could be analyzed into a small set of observation-sentences, the logical positivists hoped to show that the gap between observation and theory does not really exist.
Despite being on very friendly terms with Carnap and other members of the Vienna Circle (with whom he visited in the early 1930s), and despite being dedicated, as they were, to scientism and empiricism, Quine argued that the reductionist project was hopeless. “Modern Empiricism,” he claimed,
has been conditioned in large part by two dogmas. One is a belief in some fundamental cleavage between truths which are analytic, or grounded in meanings independently of matters of fact, and truths which are synthetic, or grounded in fact. The other dogma is reductionism: the belief that each meaningful statement is equivalent to some logical construct upon terms which refer to immediate experience. (Quine 1951, 20)
“Both dogmas,” says Quine, “are ill-founded.”
The first dogma with which Quine is concerned is that there is an important distinction to be made between analytic and synthetic claims. Traditionally, the notions of analytic truth, a priori truth, and necessary truth have been closely linked to one another, forming a conceptual network that stands over against the supposedly contradictory network of a posteriori, contingent, and synthetic truths. Each of these categories will be explained briefly prior to addressing Quine’s critique of this “dogma” (for a more extensive treatment see the article on A Priori and A Posteriori).
An a priori truth is a proposition that can be known to be true by intuition or pure reason, without making empirical observations. For instance, neither mathematical truths such as 2+2=4, nor logical truths such as If ((a=b) &(b=c)) then (a=c), nor semantic truths such as All bachelors are unmarried men, depend upon the realization of any corresponding, worldly state of affairs, either in order to be true or to be known. A posteriori truths, on the other hand, are truths grounded in or at least known only by experience, including both mundane truths such as The cat is on the mat and scientific truths such as Bodies in free-fall accelerate at 9.8 m/s2.
Many (if not all) a priori truths seem to be necessary—that is, they could not have been otherwise. On the other hand, many (if not all) a posteriori truths seem to be contingent—that is, that they could have been otherwise: the cat might not have been on the mat, and, for all we know, the rate of acceleration for bodies in freefall might have been different than what it is.
Finally, the necessity and a prioricity of such truths seem to be linked to their analyticity. A proposition is analytically true if the meanings of its terms require it to be true. For example, the proposition “All bachelors are men” is analytically true, because “man” is connected to “bachelor” in virtue of its meaning—a fact recognized by analyzing “bachelor” so as to see that it means “unmarried man”. On the other hand, “All bachelors have left the room” is not analytically true. It is called a synthetic proposition or truth, because it involves terms or concepts that are not connected analytically by their individual meanings, but only insofar as they are synthesized (brought together) in the proposition itself. Such truths are usually, and perhaps always, a posteriori and contingent.
Historically, philosophers have tended to try to explain necessity, a prioricity and analyticity by appealing to abstract objects such as Plato’s Forms or Aristotle’s essences. Such entities purportedly transcend the realm of time, space, and/or the senses, and hence the realm of “nature” as defined by science—at least as this was understood by the scientific naturalism of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. Consequently, devotees of scientific naturalism required an alternative account of necessity, a priority, and analyticity; and here analytic philosophy’s linguistic turn seemed to offer a way forward.
For obvious reasons, and as the above quotation from Quine hints, analytic truths traditionally have been characterized as “true in virtue of meaning.” However, historically, “meaning” has been cashed out in different ways: in terms of abstract, Ideal entities (Plato, Aristotle, Husserl), and in terms of concepts (Locke, Hume), and in terms of language (construed as a system of concrete, sensible symbols with conventionally approved uses). In the context of analytic philosophy’s “linguistic turn,” it was all too easy to take the latter approach, and hence to treat analyticity as deriving from some linguistic phenomenon such as synonymy or the interchangeability of terms.
Such a view was highly amenable to the scientistic, naturalistic, and empiricistic leanings of many early analysts, and especially to the logical positivists. On the assumptions that meaning is fundamentally linguistic and that language is a conventional symbol-system in which the symbols are assigned meanings by fiat, one can explain synonymy without referring to anything beyond the realm of time, space and the senses. If one can then explain analyticity in terms of synonymy, and explain both necessity and a prioricity in terms of analyticity, then one will have theories of analytic, necessary, and a priori truths consistent with scientific naturalism.
Given Quine’s own commitment to scientific naturalism, one might have expected him to join the logical positivists and others in embracing this model and then striving for a workable version of it. However, Quine proposed a more radical solution to the scientific naturalist’s problem with necessity, a prioricity, and analyticity: namely, he proposed to reject the distinctions between analytic and synthetic, a priori and a posteriori, necessary and contingent.
He begins undermining the notion that synonymy-relations are established by fiat or “stipulative definition.” On the naturalistic view of language and meaning, all meanings and synonymy relations would have to have been established by some person or people making stipulative definitions at some particular place and time. For instance, someone would have had to have said, at some point in history, “henceforth, the symbol ‘bachelor’ shall be interchangeable with the symbol ‘unmarried man’.” However, Quine asks rhetorically, “who defined it thus, or when?” (Quine 1951, 24). The point is that we have no evidence of this ever having happened. Thus, at the very least, the naturalistic account of meaning/synonymy is an unverifiable theory of the sort the positivists wanted to avoid. Moreover, what empirical evidence we do have suggests that it is likely false, for, as Quine sees it, “definition—except in the extreme case of the explicitly conventional introduction of new notation—hinges on prior relationships of synonymy” (Quine 1951, 27). In cases where it appears that someone is making a stipulative definition—as in a dictionary, for example—Quine explains that, far from establishing synonymy, the stipulator is either describing or making use of synonymy relations already present in the language. After exploring several kinds of cases in which stipulative definitions seem to establish synonymy relations, he concludes that all but one—the banal act of coining an abbreviation—rely on pre-existing synonymy relations. The upshot is that stipulative definition cannot account for the breadth of cases in which synonymy is exemplified, and thus that it cannot be the general ground of either synonymy or analyticity.
With its foundation thus undermined, the naturalistic theory of analyticity, necessity and a prioricity collapses. However, rather than rejecting naturalism on account of its inability to explain these phenomena, Quine rejects the notion that naturalism needs to explain them on the ground that they are spurious categories. Prima facie, of course, there seems to be a distinction between the analytic and the synthetic, the a priori and the a posteriori, the necessary and the contingent. However, when we attempt to get a deeper understanding of these phenomena by defining them, we cannot do it. Quine explores several other ways of defining analyticity in addition to synonymy and stipulative definition, ultimately concluding that none work. To the contrary, analyticity, synonymy, necessity and related concepts seem to contribute to each other’s meaning/definition in a way that “is not flatly circular, but something like it. It has the form, figuratively speaking, of a closed curve in space” (Quine 1951, 29). Because none of them can be defined without invoking one of the others, no one of them can be eliminated by reducing it to one of the others. Rather than concluding that analyticity, a prioricity, necessity, and so forth are primitive phenomena, Quine takes their indefinability to indicate that there is no genuine distinction to be drawn between them and their traditional opposites.
This brings us to the second dogma. When Quine criticizes “reductionism,” he has principally in mind the logical positivists’ tendency to pursue the reductionist project as if every and any scientific statement, considered in isolation, could be reduced to/analyzed into a small set of observational statements related to it in such a way that they counted uniquely as that claim’s verification and meaning. Over against this “atomistic” or “isolationist” or “local” conception of verification/reductive analysis, Quine argued that scientific claims have predictive power, and hence verifiability or falsifiability, and hence also meaning, only as parts of large networks of claims that together form far-reaching theories that might be called “worldviews.” For this reason, one can never verify or falsify an isolated scientific claim; rather, verification and falsification—and hence also meaning—are holistic. Observations (and observation sentences) that may seem to verify a lone claim actually make a partial contribution to the verification of the total theoretical network to which it belongs.
As the language here suggests, viewed holistically, verification is never absolute. There is no manageable set of observations that will verify a total theory or any of its constitutive claims once and for all. By the same token, observations (and observation sentences) that may seem to falsify a lone claim do not decisively falsify either it or the theory to which it belongs. Rather, such observations require only that some adjustment be made to the theory. Perhaps one of its constitutive claims must be rejected, but not necessarily the one that initially seemed to be falsified. On Quine’s view, any constitutive claim can be saved by making adjustments elsewhere in the theory-network.
This holistic view of meaning and verification reinforces Quine’s rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction and its fellows. Holism in these areas implies that no claim in one’s total theory is immune from revision or rejection in light of observational evidence. This means that even claims traditionally thought to be necessary and/or analytic, such as those of mathematics and logic, can be revised or rejected in order to preserve other claims to which one is more deeply committed.
Quine’s assault on the analytic/synthetic distinction undermines not merely the positivists’ reductionist project, but also the general practice of analysis which, from the beginning, had been understood to involve the transformation of a sentence into another sentence semantically equivalent (synonymous) but grammatically different. At the same time, Quine’s holism about the meaning of scientific claims and their verification generalizes to become a theory of meaning holism that applies to all meaningful claims whatsoever. However, following Moore’s practice, the analytic method was usually applied to claims in isolation, apart from considerations of their connection to other claims that together might constitute a philosophical “worldview.” Quinean meaning holism undermines this aspect of analysis just as much as it does the logical positivists “isolationist” view of verification.
Thanks to G.E. Moore, ordinary-language analysis had had a place in the analytic movement from the very beginning. Because of the perceived superiority of ideal-language analysis, however, it dropped almost completely out of sight for several decades. In the 1930s, ordinary-language analysis began to make a comeback thanks mainly to Wittgenstein—whose views had undergone radical changes during the 1920s—but also to a number of other talented philosophers including John Wisdom, John Austin (not to be confused with the nineteenth-century John Austin who invented legal positivism), Gilbert Ryle, Peter Strawson and Paul Grice. Despite differences in their reasons for adopting the ordinary-language approach as well as their respective manners of employing it, these figures’ common focus on ordinary language was a substantial point of unity over against the initially dominant ideal-language approach.
Ordinary-language philosophy became dominant in analytic philosophy only after World War II—hence the dates for the ordinary-language era given in the Introduction are 1945-1965. Indeed, with the exception of several articles by Ryle, the most important texts of the ordinary-language camp were published in 1949 and later—in some cases not until much later, when the linguistic approach to philosophy in all its forms was already on its way out.
Ordinary-language philosophy is sometimes called “Oxford philosophy.” This is because Ryle, Austin, Strawson and Grice were all Oxford dons. They were the most important representatives of the ordinary-language camp after Wittgenstein (who was at Cambridge). After Wittgenstein died in the early years of the ordinary-language era, they lived to promote it through its heyday.
Despite the strong connection to Oxford, Wittgenstein is usually taken to be the most important of the ordinary-language philosophers. For this reason, we will focus only on his later views in giving a more detailed example of ordinary language philosophy.
While logical positivism was busy crumbling under the weight of self-referential incoherence, a larger problem was brewing for ideal-language philosophy in general. After publishing the Tractatus, Wittgenstein retired from philosophy and went to teach grade-school in the Austrian countryside. Why wouldn’t he leave academia—after all, he believed he had already lain to rest all the traditional problems of philosophy!
During his time away from the academy, Wittgenstein had occasion to rethink his views about language. He concluded that, far from being a truth-functional calculus, language has no universally correct structure—that is, there is no such thing as an ideal language. Instead, each language-system—be it a full-fledged language, a dialect, or a specialized technical language used by some body of experts—is like a game that functions according to its own rules.
These rules are not of the sort found in grammar books—those are just attempts to describe rules already found in the practices of some linguistic community. Real linguistic rules, according to the later Wittgenstein, cannot be stated, but are rather shown in the complex intertwining of linguistic and non-linguistic practices that make up the “form of life” of any linguistic community. Language is, for the later Wittgenstein, an intrinsically social phenomenon, and its correct modes are as diverse as the many successful modes of corporate human life. Consequently, it cannot be studied in the abstract, apart from its many particular embodiments in human communities.
In contrast with his views in the Tractatus, the later Wittgenstein no longer believed that meaning is a picturing-relation grounded in the correspondence relationships between linguistic atoms and metaphysical atoms. Instead, language systems, or language games, are unanalyzable wholes whose parts (utterances sanctioned by the rules of the language) have meaning in virtue of having a role to play—a use—within the total form of life of a linguistic community. Thus it is often said that for the latter Wittgenstein meaning is use. On this view, the parts of a language need not refer or correspond to anything at all—they only have to play a role in a form of life.
It is important to note that even in his later thought, Wittgenstein retained the view that traditional philosophical problems arise from linguistic error, and that true philosophy is about analyzing language so as to grasp the limits of meaning and see that error for what it is—a headlong tumble into confusion or meaninglessness. However, his new understanding of language required a new understanding of analysis. No longer could it be the transformation of some ordinary language statement into the symbolic notation of formal logic purportedly showing its true form. Instead, it is a matter of looking at how language is ordinarily used and seeing that traditional philosophical problems arise only as we depart from that use.
“A philosophical problem,” says Wittgenstein, “has the form: ‘I don’t know my way about’” (Wittgenstein 1953, ¶123), that is, I don’t know how to speak properly about this, to ask a question about this, to give an answer to that question. If I were to transcend the rules of my language and say something anyhow, what I say would be meaningless nonsense. Such are the utterances of traditional, metaphysical philosophy. Consequently, philosophical problems are to be solved, or rather dissolved,
by looking into the workings of our language, and that in such a way as to make us recognize its workings: … The problems are solved, not by giving new information, but by arranging what we have always known. (Wittgenstein 1953, ¶ 109)
And “what we have always known” is the rules of our language. “The work of the philosopher,” he says, “consists in assembling reminders for a particular purpose” (Wittgenstein 1953, ¶ 127). These reminders take the form of examples of how the parts of language are ordinarily used in the language game out of which the philosoher has tried to step. Their purpose is to coax the philosopher away from the misuse of language essential to the pursuit of traditional philosophical questions. Thus the true philosophy becomes a kind of therapy aimed at curing a lingusitic disease that cripples one’s ability to fully engage in the form of life of one’s linguistic community. True philsophy, Wittgenstein says, “is a battle against the bewitchment of our intelligence by means of language” (Wittgenstein 1953, ¶ 109). The true philosopher’s weapon in this battle is “to bring words back from their metaphysical to their everyday use” (Wittgenstein 1953, ¶ 116), so that “the results of philosophy are the uncovering of one or another piece of plain nonsense and of bumps that the understanding has gotten by running its head up against the limits of language” (Wittgenstein 1953, ¶ 119).
Though Wittgenstein developed these new views much earlier (mainly in the 1920s and 30s), they were not officially published until 1953, in the posthumous Philosophical Investigations. Prior to this, Wittgenstein’s new views were spread largely by word of mouth among his students and other interested persons.
By the mid-1960s the era of linguistic philosophy was coming to a close. The causes of its demise are variegated. For one thing, it was by this time apparent that there were deep divisions within the analytic movement, especially between the ordinary-language and ideal-language camps, over the nature of language and meaning on the one hand, and over how to do philosophy on the other. Up to this point, the core of analytic philosophy had been the view that philosophical problems are linguistic illusions generated by violating the boundaries of meaning, and that they were to be solved by clearly marking those boundaries and then staying within them. It was now becoming clear, however, that this was no easy task. Far from being the transparent phenomenon that the early analysts had taken it to be, linguistic meaning was turning out to be a very puzzling phenomenon, itself in need of deep, philosophical treatment.
Indeed, it was becoming clear that many who had held the core analytic view about the nature of philosophy had relied upon different theories of meaning sometimes implicit, never sufficiently clear, and frequently implausible. The internal failure of logical positivism combined with the external criticisms of Wittgenstein and Quine contributed to the demise of the ideal-language approach. On the other hand, many, including Bertrand Russell, saw the ordinary-language approach as falling far short of serious, philosophical work. For this and other reasons, the ordinary-language approach also drew fire from outside the analytic movement, in the form of Ernest Gellner’s Words and Things (1959) and W.C.K. Mundle’s Critique of Linguistic Philosophy (1970). The former especially had a large, international impact, thereby contributing to what T. P. Uschanov has called “the strange death of ordinary language philosophy.”
The waning of linguistic philosophy signaled also the waning of attempts to specify the proper philosophical method, or even just the method distinctive of analytic philosophy. Quine’s take on the matter—that philosophy is continuous with science in its aims and methods, differing only in the generality of its questions—proved influential and achieved a certain level of dominance for a time, but not to the extent that the linguistic conception of philosophy had during its sixty-year run. Alternatives tied less tightly to the empirical sciences soon emerged, with the result that philosophical practice in contemporary analytic philosophy is now quite eclectic. In some circles, the application of formal techniques is still regarded as central to philosophical practice, though this is now more likely to be regarded as a means of achieving clarity about our concepts than as a way of analyzing language. In other circles meticulous expression in ordinary language is seen to provide a sufficient level of clarity.
Partly because of Quine’s view of philosophy as continuous with science (which, of course, is divided into specializations), and partly because analytic philosophy had always been given to dealing with narrowly-defined questions in isolation from others, post-linguistic analytic philosophy partitioned itself into an ever-increasing number of specialized sub-fields. What had been linguistic philosophy metamorphosed into what we now know as the philosophy of language. Epistemology, the philosophy of mind, the philosophy of science, ethics and meta-ethics, and even metaphysics emerged or re-emerged as areas of inquiry not indifferent to linguistic concerns, but not themselves intrinsically linguistic. Over time, the list has expanded to include aesthetics, social and political philosophy, feminist philosophy, the philosophy of religion, philosophy of law, cognitive science, and the history of philosophy.
On account of its eclecticism, contemporary analytic philosophy defies summary or general description. By the same token, it encompasses far too much to discuss in any detail here. However, two developments in post-linguistic analytic philosophy require special mention.
Metaphysics has undergone a certain sort of renaissance in post-linguistic analytic philosophy. Although contemporary analytic philosophy does not readily countenance traditional system-building metaphysics (at least as a respected professional activity), it has embraced the piecemeal pursuit of metaphysical questions so wholeheartedly that metaphysics is now seen as one of its three most important sub-disciplines. (The other two are epistemology and the philosophy of language; all three are frequently referred to as “core” analytic areas or sub-disciplines.) This is noteworthy given analytic philosophy’s traditional anti-metaphysical orientation.
The return of metaphysics is due mainly to the collapse of those theories of meaning which originally had banned it as meaningless, but later developments in the philosophy of language also played a role. In the 1960s, the ordinary-language philosopher Peter Strawson began advocating for what he called “descriptive metaphysics,” a matter of looking to the structure and content of natural languages to illuminate the contours of different metaphysical worldviews or “conceptual schemes.” At the same time, and despite his naturalism and scientism which pitted him against speculative metaphysics, Quine’s holistic views about meaning and verification opened the door to speculative metaphysics by showing that theory cannot be reduced to observation even in the sciences. In the 1960s and 70s, the attempts of Donald Davidson and others to construct a formal theory of meaning based on Alfred Tarski’s formal definition of truth eventually led to the development of possible worlds semantics by David Lewis. Consistent with the Quinean insight that meaning is connected to holistic worldviews or, in more metaphysical terms, world-states, possible worlds semantics defines important logical concepts such as validity, soundness and completeness, as well as concepts that earlier logics were incapable of handling—such as possibility and necessity—in terms of total descriptions of a way that some worlds or all worlds might be/have been. For example, proposition p is necessary, if p is true in all possible worlds. Thus, despite its formalism, possible world semantics approximates some aspects of traditional metaphysics that earlier analytic philosophy eschewed.
With the advent of possible worlds semantics, attention shifted from the notion of meaning to that of reference. The latter has to do explicitly with the language-world connection, and so has an overtly metaphysical aspect. In the 1970s, direct reference theories came to dominate the philosophy of language. Developed independently by Saul Kripke and Ruth Barcan Marcus, a direct reference theory claims that some words—particularly proper names—have no meaning, but simply serve as “tags” (Marcus’ term) or “rigid designators” (Kripke’s term) for the things they name. Tagging or rigid designation is usually spelled-out in terms of possible worlds: it is a relation between name and thing such that it holds in all possible worlds. This then provides a linguistic analog of a metaphysical theory of identity the likes of which one finds in traditional “substance” metaphysics such as that of Aristotle. With the restrictions characteristic of earlier analytic philosophy removed, these positions in the philosophy of language made for an easy transition into metaphysics proper.
Because analytic philosophy initially saw itself as superseding traditional philosophy, its tendency throughout much of the twentieth century was to disregard the history of philosophy. It is even reported that a sign reading “just say no to the history of ideas” once hung on a door in the Philosophy building at Princeton University (Grafton 2004, 2). Though earlier analytic philosophers would sometimes address the views of a philosopher from previous centuries, they frequently failed to combine philosophical acumen with historical care, thereby falling into faulty, anachronistic interpretations of earlier philosophers.
Beginning in the 1970s, some in the analytic context began to rebel against this anti-historical attitude. The following remembrance by Daniel Garber describes well the emerging historical consciousness in the analytic context (though this was not then and is not now so widespread as to count as characteristic of analytic philosophy itself):
What my generation of historians of philosophy was reacting against was a bundle of practices that characterized the writing of the history of philosophy in the period: the tendency to substitute rational reconstructions of a philosopher’s views for the views themselves; the tendency to focus on an extremely narrow group of figures (Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, Locke, Berkeley and Hume in my period); within that very narrow canon the tendency to focus on just a few works at the exclusion of others, those that best fit with our current conception of the subject of philosophy; the tendency to work exclusively from translations and to ignore secondary work that was not originally written in English; the tendency to treat the philosophical positions as if they were those presented by contemporaries, and on and on and on. (Garber 2004, 2)
Over against this “bundle of practices,” the historical movement began to interpret the more well-known problems and views of historical figures in the context of, first, the wholes of their respective bodies of work, second, their respective intellectual contexts, noting how their work related to that of the preceding generation of thinkers, and, third, the broader social environment in which they lived and thought and wrote.
Eventually, this new historical approach was adopted by philosopher-scholars interested in the history of analytic philosophy itself. As a result, the last two decades have seen the emergence of the history (or historiography) of analytic philosophy as an increasingly important sub-discipline within analytic philosophy itself. Major figures in this field include Tom Baldwin, Hans Sluga, Nicholas Griffin, Peter Hacker, Ray Monk, Peter Hylton, Hans-Johann Glock and Michael Beaney, among a good many others. The surge of interest in the history of analytic philosophy has even drawn efforts from philosophers better known for work in “core” areas of analytic philosophy, such as Michael Dummett and Scott Soames.
Some of these authors are responsible for discovering or re-discovering the fact that neither Moore nor Russell conceived of themselves as linguistic philosophers. Others have been involved in the debate over Frege mentioned in Section 2c. All this has served to undermine received views and to open a debate concerning the true nature of analytic philosophy and the full scope of its history. (For more on this, see Preston 2004, 2005a-b).
The main divisions of this bibliography correspond to the main divisions of the article, which in turn correspond to the main historical phases of analytic philosophy. In addition, there is at the end a section on anthologies, collections and reference works that do not fit nicely under the other headings.
U. S. A.
Last updated: March 25, 2006 | Originally published: