Anaxagoras of Clazomenae was an important Presocratic natural philosopher and scientist who lived and taught in Athens for approximately thirty years. He gained notoriety for his materialistic views, particularly his contention that the sun was a fiery rock. This led to charges of impiety, and he was sentenced to death by the Athenian court. He avoided this penalty by leaving Athens, and he spent his remaining years in exile. While Anaxagoras proposed theories on a variety of subjects, he is most noted for two theories. First, he speculated that in the physical world everything contains a portion of everything else. His observation of how nutrition works in animals led him to conclude that in order for the food an animal eats to turn into bone, hair, flesh, and so forth, it must already contain all of those constituents within it. The second theory of significance is Anaxagoras’ postulation of Mind (Nous) as the initiating and governing principle of the cosmos.
The exact chronology of Anaxagoras is unknown, but most accounts place his dates around 500-428 BCE. Some have argued for dates of c. 534-467 BCE, but the 500-428 time period is the most commonly accepted among scholars. Anaxagoras was born in Ionia in the town of Clazomenae, a lively port city on the coast of present-day Turkey. As such, he is considered to be both the geographical and theoretical successor to the earliest Ionian philosophers, particularly Anaximenes. Eventually, Anaxagoras made his way to Athens and he is often credited with making her the home of Western philosophical and physical speculation. Anaxagoras remained in Athens for some thirty years, according to most accounts, until he was indicted on the charge of impiety and sentenced to death. Rather than endure this penalty, Anaxagoras, with the help of his close friend and student, Pericles, went to Lampsacus, in Asia Minor, where he lived until his death.
Anaxagoras’ trial and sentencing in Athens were motivated by a combination of political and religious concerns. His close association with Pericles left him vulnerable to those who wished to discredit the powerful and controversial student through the teacher. Furthermore, his materialistic beliefs and teachings were quite contrary to the standard orthodoxy of the time, particularly his view that the heavenly bodies were fiery masses of rock whirling around the earth in ether. Such convictions are famously attested to inPlato’s Apology when Socrates, accused by Meletus of believing that the sun is stone and the moon is earth, distances himself from such atheistic notions:
My dear Meletus, do you think you are prosecuting Anaxagoras? Are you so contemptuous of the jury and think them so ignorant of letters as not to know that the books of Anaxagoras of Clazomenae are full of those theories, and further, that the young men learn from me what they can buy from time to time for a drachma, at most, in the bookshops, and ridicule Socrates if he pretends that these theories are his own, especially as they are so absurd? (26d)
As with the dates of his birth and death, the chronology of Anaxagoras’ exile and subsequent time in Lampsacus are a bit of a mystery. Some of the historical testimonies indicate that his trial occurred shortly before the Peloponnesian War, around 431 BCE. If this is the case, then Anaxagoras’ time in exile would have lasted no more than a few years. Other records indicate that his trial and exile occurred much earlier, and his time in Lampsacus enabled him to start an influential school where he taught for nearly twenty years. With regard to the persona of Anaxagoras, there are quite a few interesting anecdotes that paint a picture of an ivory tower scientist and philosopher who was extremely detached from the general concerns and practical matters of life. While the stories are possibly fanciful, the consistent image of Anaxagoras presented throughout antiquity is that of a person entirely consumed by the pursuit of knowledge. In fact, he apparently maintained that the opportunity to study the universe was the fundamental reason why it is better to be born than to not exist.
In his Lives of the Philosophers, Diogenes Laertius states that Anaxagoras is among those philosophers who wrote only one book. This work was a treatise on natural philosophy and, as the above quote from the Apology indicates, it was probably not a very long work, since it could be purchased for “a drachma, at most.” Although the book has not survived, it was available until at least the sixth-century CE. While it is impossible to recreate the entire content and order of his work, various ancient sources have provided scholars with enough information to fairly represent Anaxagoras’ philosophy. Noteworthy among these sources are Aristotle, Theophrastus (ca. 372-288 BCE) and Themistius (ca. 317-387 CE). We are primarily indebted, however, to Simplicius (sixth-century CE) for most of our knowledge of, and access to, the fragments of Anaxagoras’ work. Before moving on to the theories of Anaxagoras, it should be noted that there are some rather wide ranging disagreements among scholars today about some of the basic tenets of his philosophy. In fact, within the past twenty years or so, there have been a greater variety of interpretations of Anaxagoras than perhaps any other Presocratic philosopher.
Anaxagoras’ innovative theory of physical nature is encapsulated in the phrase, “a portion of everything in everything.” Its primary expression is found in the following difficult fragment:
And since the portions of both the large and the small are equal in amount, in this way too all things would be in everything; nor can they be separate, but all things have a portion of everything. Since there cannot be a smallest, nothing can be separated or come to be by itself, but as in the beginning now too all things are together. But in all things there are many things, equal in amount, both in the larger and the smaller of the things being separated off. (frag. 6)
It should be pointed out that it is rather difficult to determine what exactly Anaxagoras meant by “things.” It is tempting to view this as a theory of matter, but this would be misguided as it tends to apply later Aristotelian categories and interpretations onto Anaxagoras. At times, the term “seeds” has been utilized but it would seem that many scholars today prefer the neutral term “stuffs” to depict this notion. In any case, this rather complex theory is best understood as Anaxagoras’ attempt to reconcile his perceptions of the world with an influential argument (presented some time earlier by Parmenides) about how reality must be conceived.
According to Parmenides, whatever is, is (being) and whatever is not, is not (nonbeing). As a result, whatever constitutes the nature of reality must always “have been” since nothing can come into being from nothing. Furthermore, reality must always “be” since being (what is) cannot become nonbeing (what is not). This argument led Parmenides to a monistic and static conception of reality. As such, the world of changing particulars is deceptive, despite appearances to the contrary. Anaxagoras appears to accept this argument of Parmenides as the following statement indicates: “The Greeks are wrong to accept coming to be and perishing, for no thing comes to be, nor does it perish.” (frag. 17) Anaxagoras could not, however, square the thesis of radical monism with his experience of a world that seems to admit plurality and change. In fact, if all of the theses of Parmenides are correct, there is no possibility of science because all empirically gathered data is misleading. Therefore, the challenge for Anaxagoras and other post-Parmenidian philosophers was to present a proper account of nature while maintaining the demand that the stuff that constitutes reality can neither come into being from nothing nor pass away into nonbeing.
Empedocles was a contemporary of Anaxagoras and, while the historical records are inconclusive, it is possible that the latter was partially reacting to the theory of the former in the development of his own views. In response to Parmenides, Empedocles maintained that the four elements—earth, air, fire, water—were the constituents or “roots” of all matter. These four roots cannot come into being, be destroyed or admit any change. Therefore, apart from the fact that there are four, they are essentially identical to the “one” of Parmenides. The roots mix together in various proportions to account for all the things in the world that we suppose to be real, such as apples, horses, etc. As an apple dissolves, it does not collapse into nonbeing, rather the mixture that has accounted for the apparent apple of our senses has simply been rearranged. Apples, and other “mortal things,” as Empedocles called them, do not actually come to be, nor are they actually destroyed. This is simply the way humans like to talk about entities which appear to exist but do not.
Anaxagoras’ relationship to Empedocles is difficult to discern, but it is possible that he was not satisfied with Empedocles’ response to Parmenides and the Eliatics. On Aristotle’s interpretation, Anaxagoras maintained that the pluralism of Empedocles unduly singled out certain substances as primary and others as secondary. According to Anaxagoras, the testimony of our senses maintains that hair or flesh exist as assuredly as earth, air, water or fire. In fact, all of the infinite numbers of substances are as real as the root substances. Therefore, under this interpretation the key problem for Anaxagoras is that under Empodocles’ theory it would be possible to divide a hair into smaller and smaller pieces until it was no longer hair, but a composite of the root substances. As such, this would no longer satisfy the requirement that a definite substance cannot pass into nonbeing. According to other interpretations, however, some of the textual evidence from Anaxagoras seems to suggest that he treated some “things” (ala Empedocles) as more basic and primary than others. In any case, the theoretical distinctions between the two philosophers are somewhat unclear. Despite these difficulties, it is clear that Anaxagoras proposes a theory of things that is distinct from Empedocles while encountering the challenges of Parmenides.
While there is some recent scholarly debate about this, Anaxagoras’ contention that all things have a portion of everything may have had its genesis in the phenomenon of nutrition. He observed among animals that the food that is used to nourish develops into flesh, hair, etc. For this to be the case, Anaxagoras believed that rice, for instance, must contain within it the substances hair and flesh. Again, this is in keeping with the notion that definite substances cannot arise from nothing: “For how can hair come to be from not hair or flesh from not flesh?” (frag. 10). Moreover, not only does a piece of rice contain hair and flesh, it in fact contains the entirety of all the infinite amount of stuffs (a portion of everything). But how is this possible?
To understand how it is possible for there to be a portion of everything in everything, it is necessary to develop Anaxagoras’ contention that stuff is infinitely divisible. In practical terms, this can be explained by continuing with the example of the rice kernel. For Anaxagoras, if one were to begin dividing it into smaller and smaller portions there would be no point at which the rice would no longer exist. Each infinitesimally small piece could be divided into another, and each piece would continue to contain rice, as well as hair, flesh and a portion of everything else. Prior to Anaxagoras, Zeno, a disciple of Parmenides, argued against the notion that matter could be divided at all, let alone infinitely. Apparently, Zeno had about forty reductio ad absurdum attacks on pluralism, four of which are known to us. For our purposes, it is not necessary to delve into these arguments, but a key assumption that arises from Zeno is the contention that a plurality of things would make the notion of magnitude meaningless. For Zeno, if an infinite division of things were possible then the following paradox would arise. The divisions would conceivably be so small that they would have no magnitude at all. At the same time, things would have to be considered infinitely large in order to be able to be infinitely divided. While the scholarly evidence is not conclusive, it seems quite possible that Anaxagoras was replying to Zeno as he developed his notion of infinite divisibility.
As the following fragment indicates, Anaxagoras did not consider the consequence that Zeno presented to be problematic: “For of the small there is no smallest, but always a smaller (for what is cannot not be). But also of the large there is always a larger, and it is equal in amount to the small. But in relation to itself, each is both large and small” (frag. 3). According to some interpreters, what is remarkable about this fragment, and others similar to it, is that it indicates the extent to which Anaxagoras grasped the notion of infinity. As W.K.C. Guthrie points out, “Anaxagoras’ reply shows an understanding of the meaning of infinity which no Greek before him had attained: things are indeed infinite in quantity and at the same time infinitely small, but they can go on becoming smaller to infinity without thereby becoming mere points without magnitude” (289). Other interpretations are somewhat less charitable toward Anaxagoras’ grasp of infinity, however, and point out that he may not have been conceptualizing about the notion of mathematical infinity when speaking about divisibility.
In any case, as strange as it may appear to modern eyes, Anaxagoras’ unique and subtle theory accomplished what it set out to do. It satisfied the Parmenidian demand that nothing can come into or out of being and it accounted for the plurality and change that constitutes our world of experience. A difficult question remains for Anaxagoras’ theory, however.
If, according to Anaxagoras, everything contains a portion of everything, then what makes something (rice, for instance) what it is? Anaxagoras does not provide a clear response to this question, but an answer is alluded to in his claim that “each single thing is and was most plainly those things of which it contains most.” (frag. 12) Presumably, this can be taken to mean that each constituent of matter also has a part of matter that is predominant in it. Commentators from Aristotle onward have struggled to make sense of this notion, but it is perhaps Guthrie’s interpretation that is most helpful: “Everything contains a portion of everything else, and a large piece of something contains as many portions as a small piece of it, though they differ in size; but every substance does not contain all the infinite number of substances in equal proportions” (291). As such, a substance like rice, while containing everything, contains a higher proportion of white, hardness, etc. than a substance like wood. Simply stated, rice contains more stuff that makes it rice than wood or any other substance. Presumably, rice also contains higher proportions of flesh and hair than wood does. This would explain why, from Anaxagoras’ perspective, an animal can become nourished by rice by not by wood.
Anaxagoras’ theory of nature is quite innovative and complex, but unfortunately his fragments do not provide us with very many details as to how things work on a micro level. He does, however, provide us with a macro level explanation for the origins of the world as we experience it. It is to his cosmogony that we now turn our attention.
Anaxagoras’ theory of the origins of the world is reminiscent of the cosmogonies that had been previously developed in the Ionion tradition, particularly through Anaximenes and Anaximander. The traditional theories generally depict an original unity which begins to become separated off into a series of opposites. Anaxagoras maintained many of the key elements of these theories, however he also updated these cosmogonies, most notably through the introduction of a causal agent (Mind or nous) that is the initiator of the origination process.
Prior to the beginning of world as we know it everything was combined together in such a unified manner that there were no qualities or individual substances that could be discerned. “All things were together, unlimited in both amount and smallness.” (frag. 1) As such, reality was like the Parmenidian whole, except this whole contained all the primary matters or “seeds,” which are represented in the following passages through a series of opposites:
But before these things separated off, when [or, since] all things were together, not even any color was manifest, for the mixture of all things prevented it—the wet and the dry, the hot and the cold, the bright and the dark, there being also much earth in the mixture and seeds unlimited in amount, in no way like one another. For none of the other things are alike either, the one to the other. Since this is so, it is necessary to suppose that all things were in the whole. (frag. 4b) The things in the single cosmos are not separate from one another, nor are they split apart with an axe, either the hot from the cold or the cold from the hot (frag. 8).
At some point, the unity is spurred into a vortex motion at a force and a speed “of nothing now found among humans, but altogether many times as fast” (frag. 9). This motion begins the separation and it is “air and aither” that are the first constituents of matter to become distinct. Again, this is not to be seen in Empedoclean terms to indicate that air and ether are primary elements They are simply a part of the infinite constituents of matter represented by the phrase “mixture and seeds.” As the air and ether became separated off, all other elements become manifest in this mixture as well: “From these things as they are being separated off, earth is being compounded; for water is being separated off out of the clouds, earth out of water, and out of the earthy stones are being compounded by the cold, and these [i.e., stones] move further out than the water” (frag. 16).
Therefore, the origin of the world is depicted through this process of motion and separation from the unified mixture. As mentioned above, in answering the “how” of cosmogony, Anaxagoras is fairly traditional in his theory. In proposing an initiator or causal explanation for the origins of the process, however, Anaxagoras separates himself from his predecessors.
According to Anaxagoras, the agent responsible for the rotation and separation of the primordial mixture is Mind or nous: “And when Mind began to cause motion, separating off proceeded to occur from all that was moved, and all that Mind moved was separated apart, and as things were being moved and separated apart, the rotation caused much more separating apart to occur” (fr. 13). As is previously mentioned, it is rather significant that Anaxagoras postulates an explanation for the movement of the cosmos, something that prior cosmogonies did not provide. But how is this explanation to be understood? From the passage above, one may infer that Mind serves simply as the initial cause for the motion, and once the rotation is occurring, the momentum sets everything else into place. In this instance it is tempting to assign a rather deistic function to Mind. In other passages, however, Mind is depicted as “ruling” the rotation and setting everything in order as well as having supreme power and knowledge of all things (see fr. 12 and Simplicius’ Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics, 495.20). In this case it is tempting to characterize Mind in theistic terms. Both of these temptations should be avoided, for Anaxagoras remained fully naturalistic in his philosophy. In fact, the uniqueness of Anaxagoras is that he proposed a rationalistic governing principle that remained free from the mythical or theological characteristics of prior cosmogonies. His philosophical successors, particularly Socrates, Plato and Aristotle, are very excited to find in Anaxagoras a unifying cosmic principle which does not allude to the whims of the gods. They hope to find in him an extension of this principle into a purpose-driven explanation for the universe. Alas, they are all disappointed that Anaxagoras makes no attempt to develop his theory of Mind in such a way.
What Socrates, Plato and Aristotle were hoping to discover in Anaxagoras was not simply an account of how the cosmos originated (an efficient cause), but an explanation for why and for what purpose the cosmos was initiated (a final cause). Their initial excitement about his theory is replaced by disillusionment in the fact that Anaxagoras does not venture beyond mechanistic explanatory principles and offer an account for how Mind has ordered everything for the best. For example, in the Phaedo, Socrates discusses how he followed Anaxagoras’ argument with great joy, and thought that he had found, “a teacher about the cause of things after my own heart” (97d). Socrates’ joy is rather short-lived: “This wonderful hope was dashed as I went on reading and saw that the man made no use of Mind, nor gave it any responsibility for the management of things, but mentioned as causes air and ether and water and many other strange things” (98b). Similarly, Aristotle calls Anaxagoras a sober and original thinker, yet chastises him for using Mind as a deus ex machina to account for the creation of the world: “When he cannot explain why something is necessarily as it is, he drags in Mind, but otherwise hew will use anything rather than Mind to explain a particular phenomenon” (Metaphysics, 985a18). Despite the fact that Anaxagoras did not pursue matters as far as his teleologically-minded successors would have liked, his theory of Mind served as an impetus toward the development of cosmological systems that speculated on final causes. On the flip side, Anaxagoras’ lack of conjecture into the non-mechanistic forces in the world also served as an inspiration to the more materialistic cosmological systems that followed.
Thus far, we have examined the role of Mind in the development of the world. But what exactly is Mind, according to Anaxagoras? Based on the evidence in the fragments, this is a rather difficult question to answer, for Mind appears to have contradictory properties. In one small fragment, for example, Anaxagoras claims that mind is the sole exception to the principle that there is a portion of everything in everything, yet this claim is immediately followed by the counter claim, “but Mind is in some things too” (frag. 11). Elsewhere, Anaxagoras emphasizes the autonomy and separateness of Mind:
The rest have a portion of everything, but Mind is unlimited and self-ruled and is mixed with no thing, but is alone and by itself. For if it were not by itself but were mixed with something else, it would have a share of all things, if it were mixed with anything. For in everything there is a portion of everything, as I have said before. And the things mixed together with it would hinder it so that it would rule no thing in the same way as it does being alone and by itself. For it is the finest of all things and the purest, and it has all judgment about everything and the greatest power. (frag. 12)
He goes on to say, however, that Mind “is very much even now where all other things are too, in the surrounding multitude and in things that have come together in the process of separating and in things that have separated off” (frag. 14).
Most commentators maintain that Anaxagoras is committed to a dualism of some sort with his theory of Mind. But his Mind/matter dualism is such that both constituents appear to be corporeal in nature. Mind is material, but it is distinguished from the rest of matter in that it is finer, purer and it appears to act freely. This theory is best understood by considering Anaxagoras’ contention that plants possess minds. It is the mind of a plant which enables it to seek nourishment and grow, but this dynamic agent in a plant is not distinct from the plant itself. This would have been a common biological view for the time, but where Anaxagoras is novel is that he extends the workings of “mind” at the level of plants and animals into a cosmic principle which governs all things. The Mind of the cosmos is a dynamic governing principle which is immanent to the entire natural system while still maintaining its transcendental determining power. From Anaxagoras’ perspective it appears to be a principle which is both natural and divine.
Anaxagoras’ theory of things and his postulation of Mind as a cosmic principle are the most important and unique aspects of his philosophy. A few other theories are worth mentioning, though it should be pointed out that many of them are probably not original and our primary knowledge of these views arises from second-hand sources.
As a natural scientist and philosopher of his day, Anaxagoras would have been particularly concerned with the subjects of astronomy and meteorology and he made some significant contributions in these areas. It was mentioned above that his outlook on the heavenly bodies played a part in his condemnation in Athens. His beliefs about the earth, moon and sun are clearly articulated in the following lengthy quote from Hippolytus, a source from the late second century CE:
The earth [according to Anaxagoras] is flat in shape. It stays up because of its size, because there is no void, and because the air, which is very resistant, supports the earth, which rests on it. Now we turn to the liquids on the earth: The sea existed all along, but the water in it became the way it is because it suffered evaporation, and it is also added to from the rivers which flow into it. Rivers originate from rains and also from subterranean water; for the earth is hollow and has water in its hollows. The Nile rises in the summer because water is carried down into it from the snow in the north.The sun, the moon, and all the heavenly bodies are red-hot stones which have been snatched up by the rotation of the aether. Below the heavenly bodies there exist certain bodies which revolve along with the sun and the moon and are invisible….The moon is below the sun, closer to us. The sun is larger than the Peloponnesus. The moon does not shine with its own light, but receives its light from the sun…. Eclipses of the moon occur when the earth cuts off the light, and sometimes when the bodies below the moon cut off the light. Eclipses of the sun take place at new moon, when the moon cuts off the light…. Anaxagoras was the first to describe the circumstances under which eclipses occur and the way light is reflected by the moon. He said that the moon is made of earth and has plains and gullies on it. The Milky Way is the light of those stars which are not lit up by the sun. (A Refutation of All Heresies, 1, epitome, 3)
A key advantage of Anaxagoras’ belief that the heavenly bodies were simply stone masses was that it enabled him to provide an account of meteorites as bodies that occasionally become dislodged from the cosmic vortex and plummet to earth. Plutarch attests that Anaxagoras was credited with predicting the fall of a meteorite in 467 BCE, but it is unclear from the historical attestations whether Anaxagoras’ theory predated or was prompted by the event.
Along with his contributions in Astronomy and Meteorology, Anaxagoras proposed a theory of sensation that works on the principle of difference. The assumption behind Anaxagoras’ theory is that there is some sort of qualitative change that occurs with any sensation or perception. When a cold hand touches a hot object the agent will only experience the sensation of heat because her hand is cold and the hot object has brought about some sort of change. Therefore, in order for this change (the sensation) to occur, it is necessary that unlike things interact with each other, i.e., hot with cold, light with dark. If like things interact—hot with hot, for example—then no change occurs and there is no sensation. Perception works the same way as our sense of touch. Humans are able to see better during the daytime because our eyes are generally dark. Furthermore, perception works the same way as touch for Anaxagoras in that there is a physical interaction with the perceiver and the object perceived. Since a sensation requires an encounter with an opposite, Anaxagoras also maintained that every sensory act is accompanied by some sort of irritation. As Theophrastus notes, “Anaxagoras comes to this conclusion because bright colors are excessively loud noises are irritating, and it is impossible to bear them very long” (On Sense Perception, 27). Anaxagoras theory of sensation and perception is in direct opposition to Empedocles who maintained that perception could be accounted for by an action between like objects.
A couple of final speculations that are worth mentioning pertain to the science of biology. It has already been noted that Anaxagoras believes plants to have minds along with animals and humans. What places humans in a higher category of intelligence, however, is the fact that we were equipped with hands, for it is through these unique instruments that we are able to handle and manipulate objects. Finally, Anaxagoras proposed an hypothesis on how the sex of an infant is determined. If the sperm comes from the right testicle it will attach itself to the right side of the womb and the baby will be a male. If the sperm comes from the left testicle it will attach itself to the left side of the womb and the baby will be a female.
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Last updated: June 16, 2007 | Originally published: