Anaxarchus (c.380—c.320 B.C.E.)

As a follower of Democritus, Anaxarchus developed the skeptical tendencies within Democritus’ thought. Although our information on him is extremely sketchy, he is a pivotal figure connecting the atomism of Democritus to the skepticism of Pyrrho, if ancient philosophical genealogies can be trusted. He allegedly abolished the criterion of truth by likening our experiences to those of dreamers and madmen. Renowned for his contentment, he earned the title “the happiness man” (ho eudaimonikos). Like Pyrrho, this contentment was based on an indifference to the value of things around him. But unlike Pyrrho, this indifference did not manifest itself in a detachment from worldly affairs. Instead, he was an advisor to Alexander the Great and actively pursued the objects of his desires, often spurning conventional values.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Sources
  2. Epistemology
  3. Ethics
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Sources

Anaxarchus was a close companion of Alexander the Great, and he reportedly accompanied Pyrrho on Alexander’s expedition to India. Apparently, Indian philosophers rebuked Anaxarchus for “fawning on kings,” and it was this rebuke that led Pyrrho to withdraw from worldly affairs. Also, unlike Pyrrho, Anaxarchus was fond of luxury. Nevertheless, he was famed for his impassivity and ability to be happy under any circumstances. This impassivity is the subject of many of the anecdotes about him, most dramatically in the widely-circulated story of his death: he was able to pay no attention to his torment as he was being pounded to death in a mortar at the orders of a tyrant he had insulted. (Zeno of Elea, however, is also said to have died in this manner, so the story is somewhat suspect.)

No philosophical works of Anaxarchus survived. We have only two “fragments” (that is, direct quotations) from his oeuvre, and few reports concerning his philosophical positions or the arguments for them. Most of our information on Anaxarchus comes in the form of colorful anecdotes, contained in much later sources, concerning his interactions with Alexander and Pyrrho. These stories are often false, being composed to make some (supposedly) humorous or edifying point.

Relying on dubious anecdotes in order to reconstruct someone’s philosophy is obviously less than ideal, but it is not hopeless, because these bogus tales were often composed in order to provide fitting and amusing illustrations of a philosophical point or position of the figure in question, and so they can be used as evidence for a person’s philosophy. For example, Plutarch reports that Anaxarchus told Alexander that there are an infinite number of worlds, causing Alexander to despair that he had not yet conquered even one (Plutarch, Tranq. 466D). This conversation almost certainly never took place. Instead, it was invented to make a neat little point about the insatiability of ambition. That is to say, even Alexander, the most powerful man in the world, could not attain all that he desired, and if this is so, wouldn’t you be better off in adapting your desires to the world, rather than engaging in vain striving in order to bend the world to your boundless desires? Nonetheless, that there is an infinite number of worlds is a thesis characteristic only of the atomists in antiquity, and so this anecdote gives us evidence that Anaxarchus was regarded as an atomist, since putting this remark in the mouth of e.g., an Aristotelian, who believes that only one world exists, would make no sense. Still, because of our sources, any conclusions concerning Anaxarchus’ philosophy will of necessity be sketchy and tentative.

2. Epistemology

Anaxarchus was accused of abolishing the criterion of truth because he likened things to painted scenery and said they resemble the experiences of dreamers and madmen (Sextus Empiricus, Against the Professors 7 87-8). This suggests that the things that we take ourselves to be acquainted with in ordinary experience, such as trees and rocks, are merely representations, like painted scenery, not the objects themselves at all. Furthermore, these experiences cannot be relied upon to get us at the truth: we are in no better position than are dreamers and madmen, people whose experiences are paradigmatically false (or at least untrustworthy).

The above points are only Anaxarchus’ epistemological conclusions, not the grounds for them. At least two different reconstructions of Anaxarchus’ reasoning can be given. In the first (in Hankinson (1995) 54-5), Anaxarchus is offering an argument from skeptical hypothesis. Such arguments from skeptical hypotheses proceed in the following way: you start by proposing some skeptical hypothesis—for instance, that you are a brain in a vat or that the world was created exactly five minutes ago. You then argue that you do not know whether or not this skeptical hypothesis holds—typically, because your situation under the skeptical hypothesis would be indistinguishable, as far as you can tell, from the situation you ordinarily think obtains. Then various skeptical inferences are drawn from this—since you do not know that the skeptical hypothesis does not hold, you are unjustified, for instance, in trusting the evidence of the senses or of your memory. On this reconstruction, Anaxarchus’ analogies operate as skeptical hypotheses. The two-dimensional surfaces of painted scenery delusively convey just the same sort of impression of a three-dimensional world as do our regular sense-impressions. But because we cannot distinguish between the delusive impressions produced by stage-paintings and the (supposedly) veridical impressions our senses normally convey, we cannot know whether the skeptical hypothesis holds, and so we should not trust the evidence of the senses. Likewise, the impressions we receive in sleep, or that madmen receive, are indistinguishable from ordinary sense-impressions—but if so, we cannot trust the senses. If this is right, Anaxarchus’ argument is an exciting anticipation of the most famous argument from skeptical hypothesis, Descartes’ dreaming argument in the Meditations against the trustworthiness of the senses. In the second reconstruction, the analogies are vivid illustrations of our epistemic predicament, but are not themselves the basis for Anaxarchus’ skeptical conclusions. Instead, he draws from his Democritean heritage. Democritus says that we know nothing genuine about objects in the external world, only about the effects that they have on our bodies (Against the Professors 7 136, DK 68 B 7). For instance, we are not really acquainted with some portion of honey in itself, we are familiar only with the way this honey makes us have certain visual sensations as atoms streaming off of it impinge upon our eyes, gustatory sensations as the soothing round atoms of the honey pleasingly and sweetly roll around on our tongues, etc. Furthermore, the information conveyed by our senses about these objects is systematically misleading. The same object may appear yellow to one person, and grey to a person with color blindness: but both sensory reports are false, since qualities like yellowness, grayness, and sweetness are not really present in the objects themselves at all. As Democritus famously puts it: “by convention sweet, by convention bitter, by convention hot, by convention cold, by convention color: in reality atoms and the void” (Against the Professors 7 135, DK 68 B 9, trans. Hankinson).

As a result, the senses give only “bastard” knowledge (Against the Professors 7 138, DK 68 B 11). And this makes Democritus conclude that attaining knowledge of the world is very difficult, perhaps impossible. Although its exact extent is controversial, there is doubtless a heavy skeptical strain in Democritus. This strain is developed further by some of his followers, such as Metrodorus, who was allegedly Anaxarchus’ teacher. Apparently he thinks that Socrates was being too optimistic when he said that the one thing he knows is that he knows nothing; Metrodorus asserts that we know nothing, not even that we know nothing (Against the Professors 7 88). Anaxarchus is another member of this group: because of the unreliability of the senses, we are no better off than dreamers and madmen when it comes to our access to truths about the world, and so, there is no criterion whereby we can distinguish what is the case from what is not.

3. Ethics

According to Anaxarchus, the key to contentment and happiness is being indifferent concerning the value of things. This claim is also central to the ethics of Anaxarchus’ traveling companion Pyrrho, and the much later skeptics who named their movement after Pyrrho. This immediately raises the question: If one is indifferent concerning the value of things, on what basis does one act? Anaxarchus gives his own distinctive answer to this question, one reminiscent of the sophists.

We cannot be sure in exactly what sense Anaxarchus is “indifferent” concerning things’ value, and why, but his Democriteanism allows us a plausible reconstruction. It is easy to extend Democritus’ reasoning concerning sensible qualities to ethical qualities, although Democritus himself did not do so. For Democritus, honey is no more sweet than bitter, because in truth it is neither sweet nor bitter—in truth, it is just a conglomeration of atoms buzzing about in the void. And a sign of this is the relativity of perception, that the same honey can taste sweet to one person, but bitter to somebody with a disease. Properties like sweetness and bitterness are not really part of the nature of the objects themselves.

Others give similar arguments concerning value, moving from the relativity of value to its elimination from nature. Wealth may be esteemed by one person and disdained by another, or the same sort of action regarded as honorable in one city and base in another. But when we think about the objects or actions themselves, none of them are really good or bad, base or honorable, by nature, but are simply regarded as such by convention. And so, any statement, such as “this action is by nature base,” which assigns a value to something in itself, would simply be false. Anaxarchus’ ethical eliminativism has been compared to J. L. Mackie’s error theory of morality (in Warren 2002).

The Pyrrhonian skeptic Sextus Empiricus would call this position a form of dogmatism, since it is a substantial metaphysical thesis about values not being part of the furniture of the world. The true skeptic, according to Sextus Empiricus, is indifferent concerning the value of things insofar as he refrains from making judgments one way or the other about whether things are good, or bad, or neither, and this indifference is based upon the equal weight of conflicting appearance and arguments that leave him in a state of suspending judgment.

Sextus Empiricus claims that suspending judgment about value helps one attain contentment in the following way: the skeptic will unavoidably sometimes suffer from cold or thirst, since he is human after all, but he does not have accompanying this discomfort the further disturbing thought “I am suffering something that is bad by nature” (Outlines of Pyrrhonism I 12), and so he is unperturbed. This same basic sort of reasoning would also be available to both Anaxarchus and Pyrrho. Pyrrho is unopinionated, and ipso facto he would have no opinions that he is suffering something bad by nature. Not caring much about things like pain and danger that most people regard as naturally bad helps him remain tranquil. (See Bett (2000) chapter 2 for more on this issue.) Anaxarchus, by contrast, does not suspend judgment about questions of value, but his eliminativism means he would never believe that he is suffering something bad by nature. Furthermore, his indifference allows him to remain content and moderate in his passions, since he never believes he is lacking in anything good by nature. If things like luxury, power, and social status, which are conventionally regarded as good, are really indifferent, and one has no beliefs about other things being by nature good or bad, on what basis does one act? Pyrrho’s life indicates one possible answer: he shows his disregard for such conventional values by withdrawing from the world and living in solitude. He pays no attention to things that are indifferent, and he is willing to do actions regarded by convention as demeaning, such as washing a pig (DL 9 66). Anaxarchus behaves quite differently. As noted above, Anaxarchus was rebuked by Indian philosophers for “fawning on kings,” and many of the anecdotes about Anaxarchus concern his pursuit of luxury: for instance, his wrapping himself up in three rugs when a cloak would have done, and his asking for a huge sum of money from Alexander when Alexander tells him to ask for as much as he wants.

Pyrrho’s disciple Timon condemned Anaxarchus for this behavior, and apparently thought of it as inconsistent with the indifference advocated by both Pyrrho and Anaxarchus. But actively engaging with the world, and pursuing what presently attracts you, is consistent with believing that the objects of one’s pursuit are by nature neither good nor bad, as long as one pursues them realizing that these objects have no value in themselves, and are pursued merely because of the value that one gives them. Realizing that they have no value in themselves, you will not be terribly distraught if you fail to attain them, and you will be able to adapt yourself to circumstances effectively. This adaptability to circumstances might be why Anaxarchus says that the ability to seize the “opportune moment” (kairos) is the boundary marker of wisdom. Anaxarchus displays this virtue in his request of great wealth from Alexander. Pyrrho would have spurned such an offer. But Anaxarchus, even though he says that it is hard to collect money, and even harder to keep it safely, seizes the opportunity and correctly guesses that Alexander would be amused and flattered by the chutzpah of his request.

And in any case, Anaxarchus does display his own sort of contempt for convention. He thinks that standards of what is right and wrong are merely conventional, and as such, one should feel free to disregard them when they get in the way of pursuing what one wants. This attitude is strikingly displayed in an anecdote concerning Anaxarchus and Alexander (Plutarch, Life of Alexander 50-52). Alexander and his friend Cleitus get into a drunken quarrel. They exchange insults, and in a rage, Alexander picks up a spear and kills Cleitus. His anger then immediately departs, and he would have killed himself if his guards had not prevented him. Over the next several days, Alexander is in a bad way, staying in his room and loudly lamenting what he has done. Anaxarchus successfully relieves Alexander’s suffering with the following remark:

Here is Alexander, to whom the whole world is now looking, but he lies on the floor weeping like a slave, in fear of the law and censure of men. He should be their law and measure of justice, if indeed he has conquered the right to rule and mastery, instead of enslaving himself to the mastery of empty opinion. Don’t you know that Zeus has Justice and Law seated beside him, so that everything that is done by the master of the world may be lawful and just?

Asserting that moral norms are merely conventional, and that one should as a result feel free to flout them if need be, is reminiscent of Callicles in Plato’s dialogue the Gorgias, and the sophist Antiphon. And indeed, Anaxarchus was sometimes called a sophist. However, unlike Callicles and Antiphon, Anaxarchus has no notion of there being things that are “by nature” just, right, or good, in contrast to those merely conventional standards.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Bett, Richard. Pyrrho, His Antecedents, and his Legacy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • The best consideration of Pyrrho’s “indifference” regarding things (chapter 1), its practical implications, and its supposed benefits (chapter 2). Bett also briefly talks about the relationship between Anaxarchus and Pyrrho (160-163); he is pessimistic about our ability to reconstruct Anaxarchus’ philosophy.
  • Brunschwig, J. 1993. “The Anaxarchus Case: An Essay on Survival,” in Proceedings of the British Academy 82: 59-88.
    • An interesting discussion of Anaxarchus’ supposedly fawning attitude towards kings. Brunschwig argues that the anecdotes paint a much more ambivalent and complicated picture than that of a simple flatterer. Also worth looking at for its extended consideration of what Anaxarchus says concerning Alexander’s deification, which Anaxarchus supported.
  • Hankinson, R. J. The Sceptics. London: Routledge, 1995.
    • Contains a brief discussion of Anaxarchus’ epistemology (54-55); also worth looking at for introductions to Democritus’ skepticism and Sextus Empiricus’ claims concerning the psychological benefits of indifference.
  • Warren, James. Epicurus and Democritean Ethics: An Archaeology of Ataraxia. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
    • Chapter 3 is the longest treatment of Anaxarchus’ ethics in English, examining our fragmentary evidence in great detail. Warren also gives a revisionary reading of the “dreamers and madmen” report in Sextus Empiricus, arguing that it has only ethical, and not epistemological, significance.

Author Information:

Tim O'Keefe
Email: see http://www2.gsu.edu/~phltso/mail-tim.html
Georgia State University
U. S. A.