Anaximander was the author of the first surviving lines of Western philosophy. He speculated and argued about “the Boundless” as the origin of all that is. He also worked on the fields of what we now call geography and biology. Moreover, Anaximander was the first speculative astronomer. He originated the world-picture of the open universe, which replaced the closed universe of the celestial vault.
His work will always remain truncated, like the mutilated and decapitated statue that has been found at the market-place of Miletus and that bears his name. Nevertheless, by what we know of him, we may say that he was one of the greatest minds that ever lived. By speculating and arguing about the “Boundless” he was the first metaphysician. By drawing a map of the world he was the first geographer. But above all, by boldly speculating about the universe he broke with the ancient image of the celestial vault and became the discoverer of the Western world-picture.
The history of written Greek philosophy starts with Anaximander of Miletus in Asia Minor, a fellow-citizen of Thales. He was the first who dared to write a treatise in prose, which has been called traditionally On Nature. This book has been lost, although it probably was available in the library of the Lyceum at the times of Aristotle and his successor Theophrastus. It is said that Apollodorus, in the second century BCE, stumbled upon a copy of it, perhaps in the famous library of Alexandria. Recently, evidence has appeared that it was part of the collection of the library of Taormina in Sicily, where a fragment of a catalogue has been found, on which Anaximander’s name can be read. Only one fragment of the book has come down to us, quoted by Simplicius (after Theophrastus), in the sixth century AD. It is perhaps the most famous and most discussed phrase in the history of philosophy.
We also know very little of Anaximander’s life. He is said to have led a mission that founded a colony called Apollonia on the coast of the Black Sea. He also probably introduced the gnomon (a perpendicular sun-dial) into Greece and erected one in Sparta. So he seems to have been a much-traveled man, which is not astonishing, as the Milesians were known to be audacious sailors. It is also reported that he displayed solemn manners and wore pompous garments. Most of the information on Anaximander comes from Aristotle and his pupil Theophrastus, whose book on the history of philosophy was used, excerpted, and quoted by many other authors, the so-called doxographers, before it was lost. Sometimes, in these texts words or expressions appear that can with some certainty be ascribed to Anaximander himself. Relatively many testimonies, approximately one third of them, have to do with astronomical and cosmological questions. Hermann Diels and Walter Kranz have edited the doxography (A) and the existing texts (B) of the Presocratic philosophers in Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker, Berlin 1951-19526. (A quotation like “DK 12A17″ means: “Diels/Kranz, Anaximander, doxographical report no.17″).
According to Aristotle and Theophrastus, the first Greek philosophers were looking for the “origin” or “principle” (the Greek word “archê” has both meanings) of all things. Anaximander is said to have identified it with “the Boundless” or “the Unlimited” (Greek: “apeiron,” that is, “that which has no boundaries”). Already in ancient times, it is complained that Anaximander did not explain what he meant by “the Boundless.” More recently, authors have disputed whether the Boundless should be interpreted as spatially or temporarily without limits, or perhaps as that which has no qualifications, or as that which is inexhaustible. Some scholars have even defended the meaning “that which is not experienced,” by relating the Greek word “apeiron” not to “peras” (“boundary,” “limit”), but to “perao” (“to experience,” “to apperceive”). The suggestion, however, is almost irresistible that Greek philosophy, by making the Boundless into the principle of all things, has started on a high level of abstraction. On the other hand, some have pointed out that this use of “apeiron” is atypical for Greek thought, which was occupied with limit, symmetry and harmony. The Pythagoreans placed the boundless (the “apeiron”) on the list of negative things, and for Aristotle, too, perfection became aligned with limit (Greek: “peras”), and thus “apeiron” with imperfection. Therefore, some authors suspect eastern (Iranian) influence on Anaximander’s ideas.
It seems that Anaximander not only put forward the thesis that the Boundless is the principle, but also tried to argue for it. We might say that he was the first who made use of philosophical arguments. Anaximander’s arguments have come down to us in the disguise of Aristotelian jargon. Therefore, any reconstruction of the arguments used by the Milesian must remain conjectural. Verbatim reconstruction is of course impossible. Nevertheless, the data, provided they are handled with care, allow us to catch glimpses of what the arguments of Anaximander must have looked like. The important thing is, however, that he did not just utter apodictic statements, but also tried to give arguments. This is what makes him the first philosopher.
Aristotle reports a curious argument, which probably goes back to Anaximander, in which it is argued that the Boundless has no origin, because it is itself the origin. We would say that it looks more like a string of associations and word-plays than like a formal argument. It runs as follows: “Everything has an origin or is an origin. The Boundless has no origin. For then it would have a limit. Moreover, it is both unborn and immortal, being a kind of origin. For that which has become has also, necessarily, an end, and there is a termination to every process of destruction” (Physics 203b6-10, DK 12A15). The Greeks were familiar with the idea of the immortal Homeric gods. Anaximander added two distinctive features to the concept of divinity: his Boundless is an impersonal something (or “nature,” the Greek word is “phusis”), and it is not only immortal but also unborn. However, perhaps not Anaximander, but Thales should be credited with this new idea. Diogenes Laërtius ascribes to Thales the aphorism: “What is the divine? That which has no origin and no end” (DK 11A1 (36)). Similar arguments, within different contexts, are used by Melissus (DK 30B2) and Plato (Phaedrus 245d1-6).
Several sources give another argument which is somehow the other way round and answers the question of why the origin should be boundless. In Aristotle’s version, it runs like this: “(The belief that there is something Boundless stems from) the idea that only then genesis and decay will never stop, when that from which is taken what has been generated, is boundless” (Physics 203b18-20, DK 12A15, other versions in DK12A14 and 12A17). In this argument, the Boundless seems to be associated with an inexhaustible source. Obviously, it is taken for granted that “genesis and decay will never stop,” and the Boundless has to guarantee the ongoing of the process, like an ever-floating fountain.
A third argument is relatively long and somewhat strange. It turns on one key word (in Greek: “êdê”), which is here translated with “long since.” It is reproduced by Aristotle: “Some make this (namely, that which is additional to the elements) the Boundless, but not air or water, lest the others should be destroyed by one of them, being boundless; for they are opposite to one another (the air, for instance, is cold, the water wet, and the fire hot). If any of them should be boundless, it would long since have destroyed the others; but now there is, they say, something other from which they are all generated” (Physics 204b25-29, DK 12A16).
This is not only virtually the same argument as used by Plato in his Phaedo (72a12-b5), but even more interesting is that it was used almost 2500 years later by Friedrich Nietzsche in his attempts to prove his thesis of the Eternal Recurrence: “If the world had a goal, it would have been reached. If there were for it some unintended final state, this also must have been reached. If it were at all capable of a pausing and becoming fixed, if it were capable of “being,” if in the whole course of its becoming it possessed even for a moment this capability of “being,” then again all becoming would long since have come to an end.” Nietzsche wrote these words in his notebook in 1885, but already in Die Philosophie im tragischen Zeitalter der Griechen (1873), which was not published during his lifetime, he mentioned the argument and credited Anaximander with it.
The only existing fragment of Anaximander’s book (DK 12B1) is surrounded by all kinds of questions. The ancient Greeks did not use quotation marks, so that we cannot be sure where Simplicius, who has handed down the text to us, is still paraphrasing Anaximander and where he begins to quote him. The text is cast in indirect speech, even the part which most authors agree is a real quotation. One important word of the text (“allêlois,” here translated by “upon one another”) is missing in some manuscripts. As regards the interpretation of the fragment, it is heavily disputed whether it means to refer to Anaximander’s principle, the Boundless, or not. The Greek original has relative pronouns in the plural (here rendered by “whence” and “thence”), which makes it difficult to relate them to the Boundless. However, Simplicius’ impression that it is written in rather poetic words has been repeated in several ways by many authors. Therefore, we offer a translation, in which some poetic features of the original, such as chiasmus and alliteration have been imitated:
Whence things have their origin,
Thence also their destruction happens,
As is the order of things;
For they execute the sentence upon one another
- The condemnation for the crime -
In conformity with the ordinance of Time.
In the fourth and fifth line a more fluent translation is given for what is usually rendered rather cryptic by something like “giving justice and reparation to one another for their injustice.”
We may distinguish roughly two lines of interpretation, which may be labeled the “horizontal” and the “vertical.” The horizontal interpretation holds that in the fragment nothing is said about the relation of the things to the Boundless, whereas the vertical interpretation maintains that the fragment describes the relationship of the things to the Boundless. The upholders of the horizontal interpretation usually do not deny that Anaximander taught that all things are generated from the Boundless, but they simply hold that this is not what is said in the fragment. They argue that the fragment describes the battle between the elements (or of things in general), which accounts for the origin and destruction of things. The most obvious difficulty, however, for this “horizontal” interpretation is that it implies two cycles of becoming and decay: one from and into the Boundless, and the other caused by the mutual give and take of the elements or things in general. In other words, in the “horizontal” interpretation the Boundless is superfluous. This is the strongest argument in favor of the “vertical” interpretation, which holds that the fragment refers to the Boundless, notwithstanding the plural relative pronouns. According to the “vertical” interpretation, then, the Boundless should be regarded not only as the ever-flowing fountain from which everything ultimately springs, but also as the yawning abyss (as some say, comparable with Hesiod’s “Chaos”) into which everything ultimately perishes.
The suggestion has been raised that Anaximander’s formula in the first two lines of the fragment should have been the model for Aristotle’s definition of the “principle” (Greek: “archê”) of all things in Metaphysics 983b8. There is some sense in this suggestion. For what could be more natural for Aristotle than to borrow his definition of the notion of “archê,” which he uses to indicate the principle of the first presocratic philosophers, from Anaximander, the one who introduced the notion?
It is certainly important that we possess one text from Anaximander’s book. On the other hand, we must recognize that we know hardly anything of its original context, as the rest of the book has been lost. We do not know from which part of his book it is, nor whether it is a text the author himself thought crucial or just a line that caught one reader’s attention as an example of Anaximander’s poetic writing style. The danger exists that we are tempted to use this stray text – beautiful and mysterious as it is – in order to produce all kinds of profound interpretations that are hard to verify. Perhaps a better way of understanding what Anaximander has to say is to study carefully the doxography, which goes back to people like Aristotle and Theophrastus, who probably have had Anaximander’s book before their eyes, and who tried to reformulate what they thought were its central claims.
The Boundless seems to have played a role in Anaximander’s account of the origin of the cosmos. Its eternal movement is said to have caused the origin of the heavens. Elsewhere, it is said that “all the heavens and the worlds within them” have sprung from “some boundless nature.” A part of this process is described in rather poetic language, full of images, which seems to be idiosyncratic for Anaximander: “a germ, pregnant with hot and cold, was separated [or: separated itself] off from the eternal, whereupon out of this germ a sphere of fire grew around the vapor that surrounds the earth, like a bark round a tree” (DK 12A10). Subsequently, the sphere of fire is said to have fallen apart into several rings, and this event was the origin of sun, moon, and stars. There are authors who have, quite anachronistically, seen here a kind of foreshadowing of the Kant-Laplace theory of the origin of the solar system. Some sources even mention innumerable worlds (in time and/or in space), which looks like a plausible consequence of the Boundless as principle. But this is presumably a later theory, incorrectly read back into Anaximander.
At first sight, the reports on Anaximander’s astronomy look rather bizarre and obscure. Some authors even think that they are so confused that we should give up trying to offer a satisfying and coherent interpretation. The only way of understanding Anaximander’s astronomical ideas, however, is to take them seriously and treat them as such, that is, as astronomical ideas. It will appear that many of the features of his universe that look strange at first sight make perfect sense on closer inspection.
The astronomy of neighboring peoples, such as the Babylonians and the Egyptians, consists mainly of observations of the rising and disappearance of celestial bodies and of their paths across the celestial vault. These observations were made with the naked eye and with the help of some simple instruments as the gnomon. The Babylonians, in particular, were rather advanced observers. Archeologists have found an abundance of cuneiform texts on astronomical observations. In contrast, there exists only one report of an observation made by Anaximander, which concerns the date on which the Pleiades set in the morning. This is no coincidence, for Anaximander’s merits do not lie in the field of observational astronomy, unlike the Babylonians and the Egyptians, but in that of speculative astronomy. We may discern three of his astronomical speculations: (1) that the celestial bodies make full circles and pass also beneath the earth, (2) that the earth floats free and unsupported in space, and (3) that the celestial bodies lie behind one another. Notwithstanding their rather primitive outlook, these three propositions, which make up the core of Anaximander’s astronomy, meant a tremendous jump forward and constitute the origin of our Western concept of the universe.
The idea that the celestial bodies, in their daily course, make full circles and thus pass also beneath the earth – from Anaximander’s viewpoint – is so self-evident to us that it is hard to understand how daring its introduction was. That the celestial bodies make full circles is not something he could have observed, but a conclusion he must have drawn. We would say that this is a conclusion that lies to hand. We can see – at the northern hemisphere, like Anaximander – the stars around the Polar star making full circles, and we can also observe that the more southerly stars sometimes disappear behind the horizon. We may argue that the stars of which we see only arcs in reality also describe full circles, just like those near the Polar star. As regards the sun and moon, we can observe that the arcs they describe are sometimes bigger and sometimes smaller, and we are able to predict exactly where they will rise the next day. Therefore, it seems not too bold a conjecture to say that these celestial bodies also describe full circles. Nevertheless, it was a daring conclusion, precisely because it necessarily entailed the concept of the earth hanging free and unsupported in space.
Anaximander boldly asserts that the earth floats free in the center of the universe, unsupported by water, pillars, or whatever. This idea means a complete revolution in our understanding of the universe. Obviously, the earth hanging free in space is not something Anaximander could have observed. Apparently, he drew this bold conclusion from his assumption that the celestial bodies make full circles. More than 2500 years later astronauts really saw the unsupported earth floating in space and thus provided the ultimate confirmation of Anaximander’s conception. The shape of the earth, according to Anaximander, is cylindrical, like a column-drum, its diameter being three times its height. We live on top of it. Some scholars have wondered why Anaximander chose this strange shape. The strangeness disappears, however, when we realize that Anaximander thought that the earth was flat and circular, as suggested by the horizon. For one who thinks, as Anaximander did, that the earth floats unsupported in the center of the universe, the cylinder-shape lies at hand.
We may assume that Anaximander somehow had to defend his bold theory of the free-floating, unsupported earth against the obvious question of why the earth does not fall. Aristotle’s version of Anaximander’s argument runs like this: “But there are some who say that it (namely, the earth) stays where it is because of equality, such as among the ancients Anaximander. For that which is situated in the center and at equal distances from the extremes, has no inclination whatsoever to move up rather than down or sideways; and since it is impossible to move in opposite directions at the same time, it necessarily stays where it is.” (De caelo 295b10ff., DK 12A26) Many authors have pointed to the fact that this is the first known example of an argument that is based on the principle of sufficient reason (the principle that for everything which occurs there is a reason or explanation for why it occurs, and why this way rather than that).
Anaximander’s argument returns in a famous text in the Phaedo (108E4 ff.), where Plato, for the first time in history, tries to express the sphericity of the earth. Even more interesting is that the same argument, within a different context, returns with the great protagonist of the principle of sufficient reason, Leibniz. In his second letter to Clarke, he uses an example, which he ascribes to Archimedes but which reminds us strongly of Anaximander: “And therefore Archimedes (…) in his book De aequilibrio, was obliged to make use of a particular case of the great Principle of a sufficient reason. He takes it for granted that if there be a balance in which everything is alike on both sides, and if equal weights are hung on the two ends of that balance, the whole will stay at rest. This is because there is no reason why one side should weigh down, rather than the other”.
One may doubt, however, whether the argument is not fallacious. Aristotle already thought the argument to be deceiving. He ridicules it by saying that according to the same kind of argument a hair, which was subject to an even pulling power from opposing sides, would not break, and that a man, being just as hungry as thirsty, placed in between food and drink, must necessarily remain where he is and starve. To him it was the wrong argument for the right proposition. Absolute propositions concerning the non-existence of things are always in danger of becoming falsified on closer investigation. They contain a kind of subjective aspect: “as far as I know.” Several authors, however, have said that Anaximander’s argument is clear and ingenious. Already at first sight this qualification sounds strange, for the argument evidently must be wrong, as the earth is not in the center of the universe, although it certainly is not supported by anything but gravity. Nevertheless, we have to wait until Newton for a better answer to the question why the earth does not fall.
When Anaximander looked at the heaven, he imagined, for the first time in history, space. Anaximander’s vision implied depth in the universe, that is, the idea that the celestial bodies lie behind one another. Although it sounds simple, this is a remarkable idea, because it cannot be based on direct observation. We do not see depth in the universe. The more natural and primitive idea is that of the celestial vault, a kind of dome or tent, onto which the celestial bodies are attached, all of them at the same distance, like in a planetarium. One meets this kind of conception in Homer, when he speaks of the brazen or iron heaven, which is apparently conceived of as something solid, being supported by Atlas, or by pillars.
Anaximander placed the celestial bodies in the wrong order. He thought that the stars were nearest to the earth, then followed the moon, and the sun farthest away. Some authors have wondered why Anaximander made the stars the nearest celestial bodies, for he should have noticed the occurrence of star-occultations by the moon. This is a typical anachronism, which shows that it not easy to look at the phenomena with Anaximander’s eyes. Nowadays, we know that the stars are behind the moon, and thus we speak of star-occultation when we see a star disappear behind the moon. But Anaximander had no reason at all, from his point of view, to speak of a star-occultation when he saw a star disappear when the moon was at the same place. So it is a petitio principii to say that for him occultations of stars were easy to observe. Perhaps he observed stars disappearing and appearing again, but he did not observe – could not see it as – the occultation of the star, for that interpretation did not fit his paradigm. The easiest way to understand his way of looking at it – if he observed the phenomenon at all – is that he must have thought that the brighter light of the moon outshines the much smaller light of the star for a while. Anaximander’s order of the celestial bodies is clearly that of increasing brightness. Unfortunately, the sources do not give further information of his considerations at this point.
A peculiar feature of Anaximander’s astronomy is that the celestial bodies are said to be like chariot wheels (the Greek words for this image are presumably his own). The rims of these wheels are of opaque vapor, they are hollow, and filled with fire. This fire shines through at openings in the wheels, and this is what we see as the sun, the moon, or the stars. Sometimes, the opening of the sun wheel closes: then we observe an eclipse. The opening of the moon wheel regularly closes and opens again, which accounts for the phases of the moon. This image of the celestial bodies as huge wheels seems strange at first sight, but there is a good reason for it. There is no doxographic evidence of it, but it is quite certain that the question of why the celestial bodies do not fall upon the earth must have been as serious a problem to Anaximander as the question of why the earth does not fall. The explanation of the celestial bodies as wheels, then, provides an answer to both questions. The celestial bodies have no reason whatsoever to move otherwise than in circles around the earth, as each point on them is always as far from the earth as any other. It is because of reasons like this that for ages to come, when Anaximander’s concept of the universe had been replaced by a spherical one, the celestial bodies were thought of as somehow attached to crystalline or ethereal sphere-shells, and not as free-floating bodies.
Many authors, following Diels, make the image of the celestial wheels more difficult than is necessary. They say that the light of a celestial bodies shines through the openings of its wheel “as through the nozzle of a bellows.” This is an incorrect translation of an expression that probably goes back to Anaximander himself. The image of a bellows, somehow connected to a celestial wheel, tends to complicate rather than elucidate the meaning of the text. If we were to understand that every celestial body had such a bellows, the result would be hundreds of nozzles (or pipes), extending from the celestial wheels towards the earth. Anaximander’s intention, however, can be better understood not as an image, but as a comparison of the light of the celestial bodies with that of lightning. Lightning, according to Anaximander, is a momentary flash of light against a dark cloud. The light of a celestial body is like a permanent beam of lightning fire that originates from the opaque cloudy substance of the celestial wheel.
The doxography gives us some figures about the dimensions of Anaximander’s universe: the sun wheel is 27 or 28 times the earth, and the moon wheel is 19 times the earth. More than a century ago, two great scholars, Paul Tannery and Hermann Diels, solved the problem of Anaximander’s numbers. They suggested that the celestial wheels were one unit thick, this unit being the diameter of the earth. The full series, they argued, had to be: 9 and 10 for the stars, 18 and 19 for the moon, and 27 and 28 for the sun. These numbers are best understood as indicating the distances of the celestial bodies to the earth. In others words, they indicate the radii of concentric circles, made by the celestial wheels, with the earth as the center. See Figure 1, a plane view of Anaximander’s universe.
These numbers cannot be based on observation. In order to understand their meaning, we have to look at Hesiod’s Theogony 722-725, where it is said that a brazen anvil would take nine days to fall from heaven to earth before it arrives on the tenth day. It is not a bold guess to suppose that Anaximander knew this text. The agreement with his numbers is too close to neglect, for the numbers 9 and 10 are exactly those extrapolated for Anaximander’s star wheel. Hesiod can be seen as a forerunner to Anaximander, for he tried to imagine the distance to the heaven. In the Greek counting system Hesiod’s numbers should be taken to mean “a very long time.” Thus, Troy was conquered in the tenth year after having stood the siege for nine years; and Odysseus scoured the seas for nine years before reaching his homeland in the tenth year. We may infer that Anaximander, with his number 9 (1 x 3 x 3) for the star ring, simply was trying to say that the stars are very far away. Now the numbers 18 and 27 can easily be interpreted as “farther” (2 x 3 x 3, for the moon ring) and “farthest” (3 x 3 x 3, for the sun ring). And this is exactly what we should expect one to say, who had discovered that the image of the celestial vault was wrong but that the celestial bodies were behind one another, and who wished to share this new knowledge with his fellow citizens in a language they were able to understand.
Although it is not attested in the doxography, we may assume that Anaximander himself drew a map of the universe, like that in figure 1. The numbers, 9, 10, 18, etc., can easily be understood as instructions for making such a map. Although Diogenes Laërtius reports that he made a “sphere,” the drawing or construction of a three-dimensional model must be considered to have been beyond Anaximander’s abilities. On the other hand, it is quite easy to explain the movements of the celestial bodies with the help of a plan view, by making broad gestures, describing circles in the air, and indicating direction, speed, and inclination with your hands, as is said of a quarrel between Anaxagoras and Oenopides (DK 41A2).
Almost nothing of Anaximander’s opinions about the stars has been handed down to us. Probably the best way to imagine them is as a conglomerate of several wheels, each of which has one or more holes, through which the inner fire shines, which we see as stars. The most likely sum-total of these star wheels is a sphere. The only movement of these star wheels is a rotation around the earth from east to west, always at the same speed, and always at the same place relative to one another in the heaven. The sun wheel shows the same rotation from east to west as the stars, but there are two differences. The first is that the speed of the rotation of the sun wheel is not the same as that of the stars. We can see this phenomenon by observing how the sun lags behind by approximately one degree per day. The second difference is that the sun wheel as a whole changes its position in the heaven. In summer it moves towards the north along the axis of the heaven and we see a large part of it above the horizon, whereas in winter we only observe a small part of the sun wheel, as it moves towards the south. This movement of the sun wheel accounts for the seasons. The same holds mutatis mutandis for the moon. Today, we use to describe this movement of the sun (and mutatis mutandis of the moon and the planets) as a retrograde movement, from west to east, which is a counter-movement to the daily rotation from east to west. In terms of Anaximander’s ancient astronomy it is more appropriate and less anachronistic to describe it as a slower movement of the sun wheel from east to west. The result is that we see different stars in different seasons, until the sun, at the end of a year, reaches its old position between the stars.
Due to the inclination of the axis of the heaven, the celestial bodies do not circle around the earth in the same plane as the earth’s – flat – surface, but are tilted. This inclination amounts to about 38.5 degrees when measured at Delphi, the world’s navel. The earth being flat, the inclination must be the same all over its surface. This tilting of the heaven’s axis must have been one of the biggest riddles of the universe. Why is it tilted at all? Who or what is responsible for this phenomenon? And why is it tilted just the way it is? Unfortunately, the doxography on Anaximander has nothing to tell us about this problem. Later, other Presocratics like Empedocles, Diogenes of Apollonia, and Anaxagoras discuss the tilting of the heavens.
Although there exists a report that says the contrary, it is not likely that Anaximander was acquainted with the obliquity of the ecliptic, which is the yearly path of the sun along the stars. The ecliptic is a concept which belongs to the doctrine of a spherical earth within a spherical universe. A three-dimensional representation of Anaximander’s universe is given in Figures 2 and 3.
Anaximander is said to have made the first map of the world. Although this map has been lost, we can imagine what it must have looked like, because Herodotus, who has seen such old maps, describes them. Anaximander’s map must have been circular, like the top of his drum-shaped earth. The river Ocean surrounded it. The Mediterranean Sea was in the middle of the map, which was divided into two halves by a line that ran through Delphi, the world’s navel. The northern half was called “Europe,” the southern half “Asia.” The habitable world (Greek: “oikoumenê”) consisted of two relatively small strips of land to the north and south of the Mediterranean Sea (containing Spain, Italy, Greece, and Asia Minor on the one side, and Egypt and Libya on the other side), together with the lands to the east of the Mediterranean Sea: Palestine, Assyria, Persia, and Arabia. The lands to the north of this small “habitable world” were the cold countries where mythical people lived. The lands to the south of it were the hot countries of the black burnt people.
The doxography tells us that according to Anaximander life originated from the moisture that covered the earth before it was dried up by the sun. The first animals were a kind of fish, with a thorny skin (the Greek word is the same that was used for the metaphor “the bark of a tree” in Anaximander’s cosmology). Originally, men were generated from fishes and were fed in the manner of a viviparous shark. The reason for this is said to be that the human child needs long protection in order to survive. Some authors have, rather anachronistically, seen in these scattered statements a proto-evolutionist theory.
It is no use trying to unify the information on Anaximander into one all-compassing and consistent whole. His work will always remain truncated, like the mutilated and decapitated statue that has been found at the market-place of Miletus and that bears his name. Nevertheless, by what we know of him, we may say that he was one of the greatest minds that ever lived. By speculating and arguing about the “Boundless” he was the first metaphysician. By drawing a map of the world he was the first geographer. But above all, by boldly speculating about the universe he broke with the ancient image of the celestial vault and became the discoverer of the Western world-picture.
Dirk L. Couprie
Last updated: July 21, 2005 | Originally published: