According to the surviving sources on his life, Anaximenes flourished in the mid 6th century B.C.E. and died about 528. He is the third philosopher of the Milesian School of philosophy, so named because like Thales and Anaximander, Anaximenes was an inhabitant of Miletus, in Ionia (ancient Greece). Theophrastus notes that Anaximenes was an associate, and possibly a student, of Anaximander’s.
Anaximenes is best known for his doctrine that air is the source of all things. In this way, he differed with his predecessors like Thales, who held that water is the source of all things, and Anaximander, who thought that all things came from an unspecified boundless stuff.
Anaximenes seems to have held that at one time everything was air. Air can be thought of as a kind of neutral stuff that is found everywhere, and is available to participate in physical processes. Natural forces constantly act on the air and transform it into other materials, which came together to form the organized world. In early Greek literature, air is associated with the soul (the breath of life) and Anaximenes may have thought of air as capable of directing its own development, as the soul controls the body (DK13B2 in the Diels-Kranz collection of Presocratic sources). Accordingly, he ascribed to air divine attributes.
Given his doctrine that all things are composed of air, Anaximenes suggested an interesting qualitative account of natural change:
[Air] differs in essence in accordance with its rarity or density. When it is thinned it becomes fire, while when it is condensed it becomes wind, then cloud, when still more condensed it becomes water, then earth, then stones. Everything else comes from these. (DK13A5)
Using two contrary processes of rarefaction and condensation, Anaximenes explains how air is part of a series of changes. Fire turns to air, air to wind, wind to cloud, cloud to water, water to earth and earth to stone. Matter can travel this path by being condensed, or the reverse path from stones to fire by being successively more rarefied. Anaximenes provides a crude kind of empirical support by appealing to a simple experiment: if one blows on one’s hand with the mouth relaxed, the air is hot; if one blows with pursed lips, the air is cold (DK13B1). Hence, according to Anaximenes we see that rarity is correlated with heat (as in fire), and density with coldness, (as in the denser stuffs).
Anaximenes was the first recorded thinker who provided a theory of change and supported it with observation. Anaximander had described a sequence of changes that a portion of the boundless underwent to form the different stuffs of the world, but he gave no scientific reason for changes, nor did he describe any mechanism by which they might come about. By contrast, Anaximenes uses a process familiar from everyday experience to account for material change. He also seems to have referred to the process of felting, by which wool is compressed to make felt. This industrial process provides a model of how one stuff can take on new properties when it is compacted.
Anaximenes, like Anaximander, gives an account of how our world came to be out of previously existing matter. According to Anaximenes, earth was formed from air by a felting process. It began as a flat disk. From evaporations from the earth, fiery bodies arose which came to be the heavenly bodies. The earth floats on a cushion of air. The heavenly bodies, or at least the sun and the moon, seem also to be flat bodies that float on streams of air. On one account, the heavens are like a felt cap that turns around the head. The stars may be fixed to this surface like nails. In another account, the stars are like fiery leaves floating on air (DK13A14). The sun does not travel under the earth but circles around it, and is hidden by the higher parts of the earth at night.
Like Anaximander, Anaximenes uses his principles to account for various natural phenomena. Lightning and thunder result from wind breaking out of clouds; rainbows are the result of the rays of the sun falling on clouds; earthquakes are caused by the cracking of the earth when it dries out after being moistened by rains. He gives an essentially correct account of hail as frozen rainwater.
Most commentators, following Aristotle, understand Anaximenes’ theory of change as presupposing material monism. According to this theory, there is only one substance, (in this case air) from which all existing things are composed. The several stuffs: wind, cloud, water, etc., are only modifications of the real substance that is always and everywhere present. There is no independent evidence to support this interpretation, which seems to require Aristotle’s metaphysical concepts of form and matter, substratum and accident that are too advanced for this period. Anaximenes may have supposed that the ‘stuffs’ simply change into one another in order.
Anaximenes’ theory of successive change of matter by rarefaction and condensation was influential in later theories. It is developed by Heraclitus (DK22B31), and criticized by Parmenides (DK28B8.23-24, 47-48). Anaximenes’ general theory of how the materials of the world arise is adopted by Anaxagoras(DK59B16), even though the latter has a very different theory of matter. Both Melissus (DK30B8.3) and Plato (Timaeus 49b-c) see Anaximenes’ theory as providing a common-sense explanation of change. Diogenes of Apollonia makes air the basis of his explicitly monistic theory. The Hippocratic treatise On Breaths uses air as the central concept in a theory of diseases. By providing cosmological accounts with a theory of change, Anaximenes separated them from the realm of mere speculation and made them, at least in conception, scientific theories capable of testing.
There are no monographs on Anaximenes in English. Articles on him are sometimes rather specialized in nature. A number of chapters in books on the Presocratics are helpful.
Daniel W. Graham
Brigham Young University
U. S. A.
Last updated: March 22, 2009 | Originally published: