Ancient Aesthetics

ancient-greek-aestheticsIt could be argued that ‘ancient aesthetics’ is an anachronistic term, since aesthetics as a discipline originated in 18th century Germany. Nevertheless, there is considerable evidence that ancient Greek and Roman philosophers discussed and theorised about the nature and value of aesthetic properties. They also undoubtedly contributed to the development of the later tradition because many classical theories were inspired by ancient thought; and, therefore, ancient philosophers’ contributions to the discussions on art and beauty are part of the traditions of aesthetics.

The ancient Greek philosophical tradition starts with the pre-Socratic philosophers. In most cases, there is little evidence of their engagement with art and beauty, with the one notable exception of the Pythagoreans. In the Classical period, two prominent philosophers, Plato and Aristotle, emerged. They represent an important stage in the history of aesthetics. The problems they raised and the concepts they introduced are well known and discussed even today.

The three major philosophical schools in the Hellenistic period (the Epicureans, the Stoics and the Sceptics) inherited a certain philosophical agenda from Plato and Aristotle while at the same time presenting counterarguments and developing distinct stances. Their contributions to aesthetics are not as famous and, in some cases, are significantly smaller than those of their predecessors, yet in certain respects, they are just as important. In late antiquity, the emergence of Neoplatonism marks another prominent point in the aesthetic tradition. Neoplatonists were self-proclaimed followers of Plato, yet starting with the founder of the school, Plotinus, Neoplatonists advocated many distinctly original views, some of them in aesthetics, that proved to be enduringly influential.

The history of ancient Greek aesthetics covers centuries, and during this time numerous nuanced arguments and positions were developed. In terms of theories of beauty, however, it is possible to classify the theories into three distinct groups: those that attribute the origin of beauty to proportion, those that attribute it to functionality and those that attribute the Form as the cause of beauty. This classification ought not to be understood as a hard-and-fast distinction among philosophical schools, but as a way of pinpointing some major theoretical trends. Oftentimes, philosophers use a combination of these positions, and many original innovations are due to the convergence and interaction among them.

Ancient philosophers were also the authors of some of the more notable concepts in the philosophy of art. The notions of catharsis, sublimity and mimesis originated in antiquity and have played a role in aesthetics ever since then.

Table of Contents

  1. Ancient Aesthetics: Methodological Issues
    1. Aesthetics in Antiquity
    2. To Kalon
  2. Three Types of Theories about the Origin of Beauty
    1. Proportion
      1. Pythagoreans
      2. Plato and Aristotle
      3. The Stoics
    2. Functionality
      1. Xenophon
      2. Hippias Major
      3. Aristotle
      4. The Stoics
    3. Form
      1. Plato
      2. Plotinus
  3. Philosophy of Art
    1. Mimesis
      1. Plato
      2. Aristotle
    2. Criticism of Arts
      1. Plato
      2. Epicureans
    3. Catharsis
    4. Sublime
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Ancient Aesthetics: Methodological Issues

a. Aesthetics in Antiquity

One of the most important foundational issues about ancient aesthetics is the question of whether the very concept of ‘ancient aesthetics’ is possible. It is generally considered that aesthetics as a discipline emerged in the 18th century. To speak of ancient Greek and Roman aesthetics, therefore, would be an anachronism. Furthermore, there are certain differences between ancient and modern approaches to the philosophical study of beauty and art that make them distinct projects. These differences were outlined and discussed by Oskar Kristeller, an influential critic of ancient aesthetics, who suggested that the ancients’ interest in moral, religious, and practical aspects of works of art—combined with their lack of grouping the fine arts into a single category and presenting philosophical interpretations on that basis—means that aesthetics was not a philosophical discipline in antiquity (Kristeller 1951: 506).

Kristeller’s critique is still often quoted and discussed in works that deal with the ancients’ ideas on arts and beauty. The question of how compatible ancient and modern methodologies are remains a relevant issue. At the same time, Kristeller’s view has been challenged by a number of compelling arguments in 20th and early-21st century scholarship.

A number of arguments against Kristeller’s interpretation of the aesthetic tradition have been raised. These arguments also pinpoint some of the central concepts that ancient philosophers used. Stephen Halliwell criticised Kristeller’s argument by pointing out that, first, the notion of mimesis was a much more unified concept of art than Kristeller allows (see below for a more detailed explanation of mimesis). Second, the 18th-century category of fine art, established in such works as Batteux’s Les beaux arts réduits à un même principe (1746), relied on the mimetic tradition, although later the focus shifted towards different conceptions of art (Halliwell 2002: 7–8). Peponi later refuted Kristeller’s claims by pointing out that ancient Greek thinkers grouped activities we call fine arts and, moreover, were interested in the effects produced by the beautiful properties of, for instance, poetry (Peponi 2012: 2–6).

James Porter has also criticised Kristeller’s premises and conclusions on three different grounds: Kristeller’s historical account is not the only one possible; “the modern system of arts” is not as clear-cut a category as Kristeller makes it out to be; and it does not follow that the existence of the concept of fine arts indicates the emergence of aesthetic theory (Porter 2009). In addition to this, it has been argued that the ideas of Plato and Aristotle are not only relevant to the preoccupations of modern philosophers but also address the foundational questions of aesthetics and philosophy of art (Halliwell 1991).

b. To Kalon

Another methodological issue concerning ancient aesthetics is a linguistic one, namely the translation and conceptualisation of the term to kalon (honestum in Latin) whose meaning contains some ambiguity. The issue at stake is the question of when this term can and cannot be read and translated as an aesthetic one. The Greek language has a rich vocabulary of terms that are uncontroversially aesthetic, but to kalon, a fairly popular term in philosophical texts, has a range of meanings from ‘beauty’ to ‘being appropriate.’ The problem arises especially in ethical discussions, when the context does not make it clear whether the usage of the term to kalon ought to be understood as aesthetic or not.

It has been customary to translate to kalon in ethical contexts as ‘fine’ or something similar. Early 21st-century thinkers have argued, however, that to kalon and similar Greek and Latin terms (to prepon in Greek; honestum and decorum in Latin) ought to be read as aesthetic concepts. The translations that ignore the aesthetic aspect of these terms may not capture their meaning accurately (Bychkov 2010: 176). Or, more specifically, the use of to kalon in Aristotle’s works often has aesthetic meaning and, therefore, can be translated as ‘beautiful’ (Kraut 2013). At the same time, some studies of Aristotle’s use of to kalon have argued that the conceptualisation and translation of the term depend on the context in which it is found. In the context of ethical discussions, more neutral or ethical translations ought to be preferred over aesthetic ones (Irwin 2010: 389–396).

2. Three Types of Theories about the Origin of Beauty

a. Proportion

The idea that beauty in any given object originates from the proportion of the parts of that object is one of the most straightforward ways of accounting for beauty. The most standard term for denoting this theory is summetria, meaning not bilateral symmetry, but good, appropriate or fitting proportionality.

The idea that beauty derives from summetria is usually attributed to the sculptor Polycleitus (5th cn. B.C.E.), who wrote a treatise entitled Canon containing a discussion of the exact proportions that generate beauty and then made a statue, also entitled Canon, exemplifying his theory. Little is known of Polycleitus’ work and ideas, but when the famous Roman architect Vitruvius used this notion in his De Architectura, he explained it in terms of specific numerical ratios. For instance, in the human face, the distance from the chin to the crown of the head is an eighth part of the whole height; the length of the foot is a sixth part of the height of the body, while the forearm is a fourth part. Then Vitruvius adds that ancient painters and sculptors achieved their renown by following these principles (Book 3.1.2). It is likely that Polycleitus’ treatise had similar contents, such as a discussion of specific ratios that produce beauty in a human body, and was therefore useful for making sculptures of idealised human forms.

i. Pythagoreans

Equally, if not more, significant for the philosophical tradition are Pythagorean ideas about the fundamentality of numbers. Of course, Pythagoreanism was far from a unified school of thought; diverse philosophers were given that name during antiquity. The Pythagoreans referred to here are the philosophers active during the 5th and 4th centuries B.C.E., such as Philolaus and Archytas.

Numbers, according to this strand of Pythagoreanism, underlie the basic ontological and epistemological structure of the world and, as a result, everything in the world can be explained in terms of numbers and the relationship between them, namely, proportion. Beauty is one of the properties that the Pythagorean philosophers use to support their doctrine, because they claimed its presence can be fully explained in terms of numbers or, to be more precise, the proportion and harmony that is expressed in numerical relationships.

Sextus Empiricus recorded the Pythagorean argument that sculpture and painting achieve their ends by means of numbers, and thus art cannot exist without proportion and number. Art, the argument continues, is a system of perceptions and the system is reducible to a number (Sextus Empiricus Against the Logicians Book 1.108–9).

The Pythagoreans had a well-known interest in music. The evidence on this topic is wide-ranging: from the reputation of Pythagoras as the first one to pinpoint the mathematics underlying the Greek music scale to Socrates’ remark in the Republic attributing to Pythagoras the claim that music and astronomy were sister sciences (Rep. 530D). Music is also said to have a positive influence on a person’s soul. According to a testimonial from Aristoxenus, music had an effect on a person’s soul comparable to the effect that medicine has on a person’s body (Diels, II. 283, 44). Arguably this role was attributed to music due to its being an expression of the harmonizing influence of numbers.

ii. Plato and Aristotle

Although generally speaking, Plato is best classified as a Form Theorist, a small number of passages in the Platonic corpus suggest a viewpoint derived from summetria, that is, a good proportion or ratio of parts.

In the Timaeus, lacking summetria is associated with lacking beauty (87D). Similarly, both in the Republic and the Sophist, beauty is said to derive from arrangements (R. 529D-530B and Sph. 235D–236A respectively). Plato’s use of summetria raises the question of how this theory was supposed to function alongside the idea that beauty derives from the form of beauty. Most likely, however, there was no contradiction for Plato. Summetria is one of the properties that beautiful things have, rather than the cause of beauty, which is its form. Summetria, as well as such properties as colour and shape, is one of the aspects that an object gains by partaking in the form.

The case is similar in the Aristotelian corpus. Aristotle named summetria one of the chief forms of beauty, alongside order and definiteness (M 3.1078a30–b6). The context for this definition is the refutation of the view put forth by the sophist Aristippus who argued that mathematics has nothing to say about the good and the beautiful (M 3.996a). Since the causes of aesthetic properties are describable in mathematical terms, mathematics does, in fact, have something to say about these things. Similarly, in Physics, bodily beauty (kallos) is named as one of the excellences that depend on particular relations (Ph. 246b3–246b19), and in Topics, it is said to be a kind of summetria of limbs (Topics 116b21). The beautiful (to kalon) is also identified with being well arranged in On Universe (397a6).

At the same time, Aristotle did not think that summetria was a sufficient condition for beauty. He claimed that size was also necessary for beauty. In Nicomachean Ethics 4.3, beauty is said to imply a good-sized body, so that little people might be well-proportioned, but not beautiful. The city as well is required to be of a certain size before it can be called beautiful (Politics 7.4).

iii. The Stoics

Summetria assumed a much more significant role in Stoicism. The Stoics defined beauty as originating from the summetria of parts with each other and with the whole. Galen (On the Doctrines of Hippocrates and Plato 5.3.17) attributes this definition to Chrysippus, the third head of the school, but all other testimonials describe it simply as the Stoic definition. This definition is meant to apply to both the beauty of the body and the beauty of the soul (Arius Didymus Epitome of Stoic Ethics 5b4–5b5 (Pomeroy); Stobaeus Ecl. 2.62, 15). Some sources suggest that there are additional conditions: for the former, colour, and for the latter, the stability or consistency of beliefs (Plotinus Ennead 1.6.1; Cicero Tusculan Disputations  4.13.30). In many respects, the Stoics inherit this understanding of beauty from their predecessors, but it is worth noting that they also often invoked the notion of functional beauty. Stoics aesthetics, therefore, was likely a combination of functional and proportion theories.

b. Functionality

The theory of functional beauty is the idea that beauty originates in an object when that object performs its functions, achieves its end or fits its purpose, especially when it is done particularly well, that is, excelling at the task of achieving that end. In an ancient philosophical context, this idea is also often associated with the notion of dependent beauty, which means an object is beautiful if it excels at functioning as the kind of object it is. It is also noteworthy that the Greek term to kalon, often—but not always—used as an aesthetic term, can be used to denote being fitting or well-executed. The functionalist theory of beauty might have been more linguistically intuitive to ancient Greeks than it is possible to convey in English.

i. Xenophon

It is hard to attribute this theory to one particular philosopher, since functionalist arguments are fairly common in ancient philosophy texts. An example of functional theory can be found in Xenophon’s Memorabilia. Socrates first makes a point about dependent beauty by saying “a beautiful wrestler is unlike a beautiful runner, a shield beautiful for defence is utterly unlike a javelin beautiful for swift and powerful hurling” (3.8.4). Then he further develops this point by adding that “it is in relation to the same things that men's bodies look beautiful and good and that all other things men use are thought beautiful and good, namely, in relation to those things for which they are useful” (3.8.5).

It is not obvious that the term to kalon employed here is used in an aesthetic sense, but a few lines down, it is said that “the house in which the owner can find a pleasant retreat at all seasons and can store his belongings safely is presumably at once the pleasantest and the most beautiful. As for paintings and decorations, they rob one of more delights than they give” (3.8.10). This remark highlights that the issue at stake is aesthetic phenomena, and that a much greater pleasure is to be gained from perceiving functionality rather than perceiving pleasing, yet artificial, colours (paintings) and structures.

ii. Hippias Major

A functional definition of beauty is also found in Plato’s dialogue Hippias Major. In this dialogue, Socrates engages in a discussion with Hippias, a sophist, in order to discover the definition of beauty. They each give a number of possible options, and one of them, proposed by Socrates, was a functional definition.

It is argued that stone, rather than ivory, is more beautiful as material for eye pupils in Pheidias’ statue and that a fig wood ladle is much better suited and beautiful than a gold one for making soup. Socrates proposes these two cases as objections to Hippias’ proposal that beauty is gold. By presenting two cases in which a beauty-making property is not some inherent property of an object, but that object’s functionality, Socrates rejects Hippias’ suggestion. This move also leads to examining the possibility that all beauty is to be defined as deriving from functionality, but this option is ultimately rejected as well on the grounds that it appears to rely on a kind of deception, because it prioritizes how things appear over how things truly are (290D–294E).

iii. Aristotle

In Aristotle’s work, there are many instances of excellence in functionality described by the term to kalon. In fact, Aristotle states outright that fitting a function and to kalon are the same (Top. 135a12–14). Since this term can be used both aesthetically and non-aesthetically, it is a matter of contention whether in some specific cases the reference for this term is meant to be an aesthetic phenomenon or not.

If to kalon is read aesthetically, some of the most pertinent passages for the functionalist understanding of aesthetic properties would come from Aristotle’s descriptions of natural phenomena. For instance, according to Generation of Animals, the generation of bees reveals a kalon arrangement of nature; the generations succeed one another even though drones do not reproduce (760a30–b3). In Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle states that dogs do not enjoy the scent of rabbits as such, but the prospect of eating them; similarly, the lion appears to delight in the lowing of an ox, but only because it perceives a sign of potential food (1118a18–23).

iv. The Stoics

A certain kind of functionality and aesthetic language also appear in certain Stoic arguments, most notably in the works of Panaetius who used the term to prepon (‘fitting’, ‘becoming’, ‘appropriate’ in English) in certain ethical arguments. Probably the most elaborate discussion of to prepon (or decorum in Latin) is recorded in Cicero’s On Duties, which represents Panaetius’ views.

Here, an analogy between poetry and human behaviour is drawn as follows. The poets “observe propriety, when every word or action is in accord with each individual character.” The poets depict each character in a way which is appropriate regardless of the moral value of the character’s actions, so that a poet would be applauded even when he skilfully depicts an immoral person saying immoral things. To human beings, meanwhile, nature also assigned a kind of role, namely that of manifesting virtues like steadfastness, temperance, self-control, and so forth. This claim reflects one of the essential tenets of Stoic ethics, eudaimonia, which is living in accordance with nature and pursuing virtue (Diogenes Laertius 7.87–9; Long and Sedley 63C). Human beings, therefore, are functional entities as well in the sense that they have a certain function and end. The idea that achieving that end produces beauty is made clear when it is said that just as physical beauty consisting of the harmonious proportion of limbs delights the eye, so too does to prepon in behaviour earn the approval of fellow humans through the order, consistency and self-control imposed on speech and acts (1.97–98).

c. Form

i. Plato

Plato’s best-known argument, the theory of forms, has much bearing on his aesthetics in a number of ways. The theory posits that incorporeal, unchanging, ideal paradigms— forms—are universals and play an important causal role in the world generation. Arguably the most important way in which the theory of forms has bearing on aesthetics is the account of the origin of aesthetic properties. Beauty, just like many other properties, is generated by its respective form. An object becomes beautiful by partaking in the form of Beauty.  The form of Beauty is mentioned as the cause of beauty throughout the Platonic corpus; see, for instance Cratylus 439C–440B; Phaedrus 254B; Phaedo 65d–66A and 100B–E; Parmenides 130B; Republic 476B–C, 493E, 507B. In this respect, the form of Beauty is just like all the other forms. Plato does, however, say that the form of Beauty has a special connection with the form of Good, even if they are not, ultimately, identical (Hippias Major 296D–297D).

The form of Beauty is shown as having a pedagogical aspect in the Symposium. In Diotima’s speech, the acquisition of knowledge (that is, the knowledge of the forms) is represented as the so-called Ladder of Love. A lover is said to first fall in love with an individual body, then notices that there are commonalities among all beautiful bodies and thus becomes an admirer of human form in general. Then the lover starts appreciating the beauty of the mind, followed by the beauty of institutions and laws. The love of sciences is the next step on the ladder until the lover perceives the form of Beauty. The form is said to be everlasting, not increasing or diminishing, not beautiful at one point and ugly at another, not beautiful only in relation to any specific condition, not in the shape of any specific thing, such as a limb, a piece of knowledge or an animal. Instead, it is absolute, everlasting, unchanging beauty itself (210A–211D).

ii. Plotinus

Plotinus, a self-proclaimed follower of Plato, was also committed to the view that beauty originated from the form of Beauty, adding some further elaborations of his own. Plotinus presents this account as a rival to the summetria theory. His treatise On Beauty (Ennead 1.6) starts with an elaborate critique of the rival theory. Plotinus claims that accounting for beauty by means of summetria has a number of drawbacks. For instance, it cannot explain the beauty in unified objects that do not have parts, such as a piece of gold.

According to Plotinus’ own theory, an object becomes beautiful by virtue of its participating in the form. He also adds that the Intellect (nous) is the cause of beauty. To be precise, it is the Intellect that imposes the forms onto passive matter thus producing beauty. Those entities that do not participate in the form, and thus reason, are ugly (1.6.2). The form is therefore capable of producing beauty by virtue of its being an instrument of the Intellect that creates order and structure out of chaotic matter in the universe, and beauty is an expression of its designing powers.

Apart from being expressions of the Intellect, forms have another aspect that makes them the cause of beauty; namely, they unify disarrayed and chaotic elements into harmony. When form approaches formless matter, it introduces a certain intrinsic agreement, so that many parts are brought into unity and harmony with each other. The form has intrinsic unity and is one, and therefore, it turns the matter it shapes into one as well, as far as it is possible. The unity produces beauty which ‘communicates itself’ to both the parts and the whole (1.6.2).

Plotinian metaphysics and aesthetics converge in the analogy between Intellect shaping the universe and a sculptor shaping a piece of stone into a statue. At the beginning of his Ennead 5.8 (On the Intelligible Beauty), Plotinus asks his readers to envision two pieces of stone placed next to each other, one plain and another one sculpted into the shape of an especially beautiful human or some god. Then he argues that the latter will appear immediately beautiful, not because of the material it is made out of but because it possesses the form. The beauty is caused by the intellect of the sculptor, which transmits the form onto the stone. The visible form that the sculptor imposes onto the stone is an inferior version of the actual form that can only be contemplated. The actual forms are purely intellectual, ‘seen’ with mind’s eye. The intellectual beauty of reason, argues Plotinus, is a much greater and also truer beauty (En. 5.8.1.).

Plotinus follows Plato in arguing that visible beauty is inferior as it is only a copy of the true beauty of forms. There is, however, a significant difference between them in terms of their attitude towards the value of artistic beauty. Plotinus warns against devaluing artistic activities and, in an argument very much unlike those found in Plato, states that (i) nature itself imitates some things. (ii) Arts do not simply imitate what is seen by the eye but refer back to the principles of nature. (iii) Arts produce many things not by means of copying, but from themselves. In order to create a perfect whole, they add what is lacking, because arts contain beauty themselves. (iv) Phidias (one of the most famous Greek sculptors) designed a statue of Jupiter not by imitation, but by conceiving a form that a god would take if he were willing to show himself to humans (5.8.1).

3. Philosophy of Art

a. Mimesis

In older scholarship, it is common to find a claim that a Greek term for art was techne, and as this is a much narrower term than the contemporary concept of fine art, it is claimed that ancient Greeks did not have a concept of fine art. This interpretation, however, has been challenged. It has been argued that, if there were a concept of fine art in Greek thought, it would be mimesis. In the most literal meaning of the term, mimesis refers to imitation in a very broad sense, including such acts as following an example of someone’s behaviour or adopting a certain custom. This word is widely used when discussing art and artistic activities, and it can be roughly defined as an imitative representation, where ‘representation’ is understood as involving not just copy-making, but also creative interpretation. Aristotle grouped poetry with “the other mimetic arts” (8.1451a30) in the Poetics, in a remark that suggests the conceptualisation of a distinct group of artistic activities resembling the notion of fine arts. A similar grouping of “imitators” (mimetai), including poets, rhapsodists, actors, and chorus-dancers can be found in Plato’s Republic as well (2.373B).

i. Plato

Books 2 and 3 of Plato’s Republic contain an extensive analysis of mimesis in the context of the education of the guardian class in the ideal city-state. In Book 2, Socrates starts developing his account of the ideal city-state. The class of guardians plays an especially important role in its maintenance, and therefore, the question of how the guardians ought to be educated is raised. Apart from physical education, the education based on storytelling is quite important, as it starts early in childhood and precedes physical education (2.376E).

First, Socrates and the interlocutors agree to ban from the guardians’ education and the ideal city-state more generally certain stories based on their content, particularly stories depicting the gods committing evil deeds (2.377D–E). At the start of book 3, there is a longer list of the kind of stories that are undesirable in the ideal city, including ones with negative portrayals of the afterlife, lamentations, gods committing unseemly acts and portrayals of bad people as happy (386A–392C).

Then there follows a discussion of the style (Gr. lexis) of narration. Socrates distinguishes direct speech, when a poet speaks in his own voice, from imitative speech, when a poet imitates the speech of the characters in the story and suggests that if a poem is written in the former style, it contains no mimesis (3. 393D). The poetry can be of three kinds: dithyrambs (in poet’s own voice, no mimesis), tragedy and comedy (pure mimesis) and epic poetry (a combination of the two) (3.394C).

The discussion turns towards the question of whether mimetic poets ought to be allowed into the city-state and whether guardians themselves could be mimetai. The answer to this question turns out to be negative. The main argument against mimesis in the ideal city goes as follows. The guardians preserve the well-being of the city, and thus the only things they ought to imitate are the properties of virtue, not shameful or slavish acts. The reason for this is that enjoying the imitation of these things might lead them to actually pursuing them, as imitation is habit-forming (3.395D–E). It is ultimately concluded that only a pure imitator of a good person ought to be allowed into the city-state (3. 397D–398B)

ii. Aristotle

Aristotle argues that poetry originates from two causes. Both of these causes are grounded in human nature, particularly the natural proneness of human beings to mimesis. Mimesis is said to be (i) the natural method of learning from childhood and (ii) a source of delight for human beings.

In order to support the latter point, Aristotle notes that although such objects as dead bodies and low animals might be painful to see in real life, we delight in artistic depictions of them, and the reason for this is the pleasure humans derive from learning. People delight in seeing a picture, either because they recognise the person depicted and ‘gather the meaning of things’ or—if they do not recognise the subject—they admire the execution, colour, and so on. (The distinction between mimesis and colour/composition is reiterated in Politics, where colour and figures are said to be not imitations but signs with little connection to morality, and therefore, young men ought to be taught to look at those paintings which depict character (1340a32–39).) This principle applies not only to visual arts. The natural inclination to mimesis combined with the sense of harmony and rhythm is the reason why humans are drawn to poetry as well (Poetics 1448b5–1448b24).

Aristotle’s conceptual analysis of poetry contains a revealing discussion of the differences between poetry and history. Poets differ from historians by virtue of describing not what happened, but what might happen, either because it is probable or necessary. They do not, however, differ because one is set in prose and another one in verse, as the works of Herodotus could be set in verse and remain history. The fundamental difference between history and poetry lies in the fact that the former is concerned with statements about particulars, whereas the latter is concerned with universal statements. Some tragedies do use historical characters, but this, according to Aristotle, is because “what is possible is credible,” which presumably means that plots involving historical characters are more moving because they might have actually happened. Another notable conclusion is that the poet is a poet because of the plot rather than the verse, as the defining characteristic of such activity is the imitation of action (1451a37–b31).

b. Criticism of Arts

i. Plato

Unlike Aristotle, Plato saw potential dangers associated with mimetic activities. In Republic 5, “lovers of beautiful sights and sounds,” people addicted to music, drama and so on, are contrasted with true philosophers. The lovers of sights and sounds pursue only opinions, whereas philosophers are the pursuers of knowledge and, ultimately, beauty in itself (5.475D–480A).

But perhaps the best-known argument criticising art comes from Book 10 of the Republic. Here, the products of artistic activities are criticised for being twice removed from what is actually the case. Socrates uses the example of a symposium couch to argue that the painting of a couch is just a copy of reality, the actual couch. Yet the actual couch made by the craftsman is also just a copy of the true reality, the forms. The painters, according to this argument, portray only a small portion of what is actually the case. For the most part, they are concerned with appearances. There are, thus, three kinds of couches: one produced by god, another one produced by a carpenter and the third one by a painter. God and the craftsmen are called makers or producers of their kinds of couches, but the painter is only an imitator, a producer of the product that is thrice removed from nature. This category is also said to include tragedians and all the other imitators (596D–597E).

These and other passages have earned Plato a reputation of being hostile to art. Plato’s theory of art, however, is much more complex, and criticism is only one aspect of his treatment of artistic mimesis. An example of a more constructive understanding of artistic imitation can be found in the same work where he famously criticises it, the Republic.

For instance, Socrates suggests that there is an analogy between the ideal political state they are discussing and an idealised portrait, arguing that no one would think the latter is flawed because the painter cannot produce an ideal person in reality and, therefore, there is no need to worry that their ideal state does not actually exist (5.472D–E). Socrates’ remark indicates that there is much more to painting than the copying of appearances. Ideas like these can be found throughout the Republic (see also 6.500E–501C; 3.400E–401A).

In fact, after banishing poetry from the ideal city earlier, Socrates praises Homer, who is said to be the best of the tragedians, and a concession is made for hymns to god and eulogies to good people. Socrates also adds that even imitative poetry could be welcomed in the city, provided there is an argument showing it ought to belong to such well-governed places (10.606E–607c). The ancient quarrel between poets and philosophers, as Plato called it, was neither unambiguous nor a settled matter.

ii. Epicureans

The Epicureans, members of the Hellenistic philosophical school notorious for its atomist physics and hedonist ethics, were also critics of poetry. The Epicurean ethical views, especially the claim that death is not evil, played a major role in shaping their perspective on poetry. The extant works of the founder of the school, Epicurus, show him criticising muthos, stories told by poets. Epicurus was concerned with the dangerous influence that these stories could have on those who hear them. The stories of poets are based on beliefs that produce the feeling of anxiety in listeners (for instance, the belief that life is full of pain and it is best to not to be born at all). The opposite of these are beliefs gained by studying nature and engaging in philosophical investigations. Such studies lead to the discovery that the greatest pleasure in life is ataraxia (the state of tranquillity) and abolishing the fear of pain and death (Letter to Menoeceus 126–7; Principal Doctrines 12). Epicurus also notoriously argued against receiving the traditional education (paideia) that includes an education in poetry (Letter to Pythocles 10.6; Plutarch 1087A).

It is noteworthy, however, that Epicurus was not unequivocally opposed to poetry and arts. Some evidence suggests that he maintained that only an Epicurean would discuss music and poetry in the right way, although the Epicureans would not take up writing poetry themselves (Diogenes Laertius, Lives 10.120; Plutarch 1095C). It appears that for Epicurus, like Plato, arts were problematic because of their power to impart incorrect beliefs and emotions that pose risks to one’s ataraxia.

Lucretius, the author of the Epicurean epic poem De Rerum Natura, espouses a somewhat different attitude toward poetry. Written in the 1st century B.C.E. in Latin, the poem is an exposition of Epicurean views including atomism, hedonistic ethics and epistemic dogmatism (especially against attacks from the Sceptics). As a whole, the poem engages very little with aesthetic issues, with the exception of the often-quoted passage from Book 1, in which Lucretius talks about the effects of poetry. He compares himself to a physician who, administering unpleasant-tasting wormwood, covers the brim of the glass with honey, not to deceive his patients, but to help them take the medicine and become better. In the same way, Lucretius himself sweetens doctrines that otherwise might seem woeful to those who are new to Epicureanism (1.931–50).

c. Catharsis

Catharsis is a psychological phenomenon, often associated with the effects of art on humans, famously described by Aristotle. There is, however, no explicit definition of catharsis in the extant Aristotelian corpus. Instead, we have a number of references to such a phenomenon. The one most pertinent to aesthetics is found in Poetics, where one of the defining features of tragedy is a catharsis of such emotions as fear and pity (1449b22–28). Another reference to catharsis can be found in Politics. Here Aristotle writes that music ought to be used for education, catharsis and other benefits (1341b37–1342a1). The lack of Aristotle’s own definition combined with the long and rich history of later interpretations of catharsis (see Halliwell 1998: app. 5) makes it hard to reconstruct a precise Aristotelian account of this term. It is arguably related to the influence that arts have on a person’s emotions and judgements that derive from those emotions (Politics 1340a1–1340b18).

It has been argued that the concept of catharsis has both religious and medical connotations, although more recent interpretations favour the view that it is primarily a psychological phenomenon that has certain ethical aspects (though it is not a means to learn ethics per se).

d. Sublime

Another aesthetic term that originated in antiquity, but was made famous by subsequent adaptations, especially by Kant and Burke, is that of the sublime. The main source for the theory of the sublime is the handbook on oratory titled Peri Hupsous (De Sublimitate in Latin), although it is also noteworthy that a notion of the sublime was known and used much more widely in antiquity (Porter 2016). The authorship of Peri Hupsous is disputable. The work has been attributed to Cassius Longinus, a Greek rhetorician in the 3rd century C.E., and an anonymous author in the 1st century C.E. referred to as pseudo-Longinus.

Fundamentally, the sublime as described by Longinus is a property of style, “certain loftiness and excellence of language.” It does have some more striking aspects, however. For instance, Longinus states that:

A lofty passage does not convince the reason of the reader, but takes him out of himself . . . Skill in invention, lucid arrangement and disposition of facts, are appreciated not by one passage, or by two, but gradually manifest themselves in the general structure of a work; but a sublime thought, if happily timed, illumines an entire subject with the vividness of a lightning-flash, and exhibits the whole power of the orator in a moment of time (1).

Longinus suggests that sublimity originates from five different sources: (i) the greatness of thought; (ii) a vigorous treatment of passions; (iii) skill in employing figures of thought and figures or speech; (iv) dignified expressions, including the appropriate choice of words and metaphors; and (v) majesty and elevation of structure. The last cause of sublimity is said to embrace all the preceding ones as well (8.1).

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Armstrong, A. 1966–88. Plotinus: Enneads. 7 vols. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Arnim, H. F. A. von. 1903–1924. Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta. 3 vols. Leipzig: Teubner.
  • Bychkov, O. and A. Sheppard, eds. 2010. Greek and Roman Aesthetics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cooper, J. and D. Hutchinson, eds. 1997. Plato: Complete Works. Indianapolis; Cambridge: Hackett.
  • Diels, H. and W. Kranz, eds. 1951–1952. Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker, griechisch und deutsch. 3 Vols. Berlin: Weidmannsche buchhandlung.
  • Dyck, A. R. 1996. A Commentary on Cicero De Officiis. Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press.
  • Goodwin, W. 1874. Plutarch’s Morals. Cambridge: John Wilson and son.
  • Hicks, R. D. 1925. Diogenes Laertius: Lives of Eminent Philosophers. London: W. Heinemann; New York: G.P. Putnam's Sons.
  • King, J. 1945. Cicero: Tusculan Disputations. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Long, A. and D. Sedley, eds. 1987. The Hellenistic Philosophers. 2 vols. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Leonard, W. E. 1916. Lucretius: De Rerum Natura.  London: Dent; New York: Dutton.
  • O'Connor, E. M. 1993. The essential Epicurus: letters, principal doctrines, Vatican sayings, and fragments. Buffalo, N.Y.: Prometheus Books.
  • Roberts, W. R. 2011. Longinus on the Sublime: The Greek Text Edited after the Paris Manuscript. 2nd edn. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Asmis, E. 1991. “Epicurean Poetics.” Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy 7, pp. 63–93. Reprinted in Philodemus and Poetry: Poetic Theory and Practice in Lucretius, Philodemus and Horace, ed. by D. Obbink, Oxford University Press 1995, pp. 15–34; and in Ancient Literary Criticism, ed. Andrew Laird, Oxford University Press 2006, pp. 238–66.
    • (A discussion of the evidence concerning the views on poetry found in the works of Epicurus, Lucretius and Philodemus.)
  • Barney, R. 2010. “Notes on Plato on The Kalon and The Good.” Classical Philology 105(4): 363–377.
    • (A discussion of functionality and its relationship to beauty in Plato’s works.)
  • Beardsley, Monroe C. 1966. Aesthetics from Classical Greece to the Present. New York: Macmillan.
    • (Relevant sections of this book contain a classic interpretation of ancient aesthetics.)
  • Bernays, J. 1979. “Aristotle on the Effect of Tragedy.” In Articles on Aristotle, edited by J. Barnes, Schofield, and R. Sorabji. Vol. 4: Psychology and Aesthetics, 154–165. London. (Originally in Abhandlungen der historisch‐philosophischen Gesellschaft in Breslau, vol. 1, 1857: 135–202; and Sonderausgabe, Breslau 1857.)
    • (A seminal paper for the study of Aristotle’s concept of catharsis; it argues that catharsis is the ‘purgation’ of emotions.)
  • Bett, R. 2010. “Beauty and its Relation to Goodness in Stoicism.” In Ancient Models of Mind, ed. A. Nightingale and D. Sedley, 130–152. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • (In this paper, the evidence for the Stoic definition of beauty as summetria is collected and interpreted.)
  • Boudouris, K. ed. 2000. Greek Philosophy and the Fine Arts, Volume 2. Athens: International Centre for Greek Philosophy and Culture.
    • (A large collection of papers on various aspects of ancient Greek aesthetics.)
  • Bychkov, O. 2010. Aesthetic Revelation: Reading Ancient and Medieval Texts after Hans Urs von Balthasar. Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press.
    • (A wide-scope monograph; the central argument concerns the notion of the revelatory aesthetics and its presence in ancient (and later) philosophical texts.)
  • Close, A. J. 1971. “Philosophical Theories of Art and Nature in Classical Antiquity.” Journal of the History of Ideas 32(2): 163–184.
    • (A study of the notion of creator/designer in antiquity.)
  • Demand, N. 1975. “Plato and the Painters.” Phoenix 29(1): 1–20.
    • (An article discussing Plato’s attitude to painting and the relationship between his views and contemporary painting traditions.)
  • Denham, A. ed. 2012. Plato on Art and Beauty. New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
    • (A collection of papers on Plato’s philosophy of art.)
  • Destrée, P. and P. Murray, eds. A companion to Ancient Aesthetics. Hoboken, NJ: Wiley-Blackwell.
    • (A wide-ranging collection of extended entries, including such topics as mimesis, beauty, sublime, art and morality, tragic emotions and others.)
  • Ford, A. 1995. “Katharsis: The Ancient Problem.” In Performativity and Performance, edited by A. Parker and E. K. Sidgwick, 109–32. New York and London.
    • (An interpretation of Aristotle’s concept of catharsis with an argument that the relevant passages from Politics help to shed light on the sparse description in Poetics.)
  • Gál, O. 2011. “Unitas Multiplex as the Basis of Plotinus’ Conception of Beauty: An Interpretation of Ennead V.8.” Estetika: The Central European Journal of Aesthetics 48(2): 172–198.
    • (A paper arguing that, for Plotinus, beauty derives from Intellect and unity in diversity.)
  • Golden, L. 1973. “The Purgation Theory of Catharsis.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 31(4): 473–479.
    • (An in-depth argument against Bernays’ interpretation of catharsis as purgation; it contains a suggestion that catharsis is better understood as intellectual clarification.)
  • Halliwell, S. 1991. “The Importance of Plato and Aristotle for Aesthetics.” Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy, vol.7, pp. 321–48. New York: Routledge.
    • (A paper arguing that Plato and Aristotle address issues that are pertinent to contemporary aesthetics.)
  • Halliwell, Stephen. 1998. Aristotle’s Poetics. 2nd edn. London: Duckworth.
    • (An extensive study of Poetics, including a number of concepts central to Aristotle’s aesthetics; also includes appendices on the history of interpreting catharsis after Aristotle, dating of Poetics and others.)
  • Halliwell, Stephen. 2002. The Aesthetics of Mimesis: Ancient Texts and Modern Problems. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • (A seminal study of the concept of mimesis in Greek philosophy and literature.)
  • Horn, H. -J. 1989. “Stoische Symmetrie und Theorie des Schönen in der Kaiserzeit.” Aufstieg und Niedergang der römischen Welt 36.3: 454–472.
    • (A study of the Stoic definition of beauty as summetria.)
  • Hyland, D. 2008. Plato and the Question of Beauty. Blooming & Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.
    • (An interpretation of Plato’s notion of beauty in Symposium, Hippias Major and Phaedrus influenced by continental philosophy.)
  • Irwin, T. 2010. “The Sense and Reference of Kalon in Aristotle.” Classical Philology 105(4): 381–396.
    • (An argument for avoiding an aesthetic translation of the term to kalon in Aristotle’s works on ethics.)
  • Kraut, R. 2013. “An aesthetic reading of Aristotle's Ethics.” In Politeia in Greek and Roman Philosophy, ed. M. Lane and V. Harte, pp. 231–250. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • (An argument for translating to kalon in Aristotle’s work as an aesthetic term.)
  • Kristeller, O. P. 1951. “The Modern System of the Arts: A Study in the History of Aesthetics Part I.” Journal of the History of Ideas 12(4): 496–527.
    • (An article containing arguably the most significant critique of the notion of ancient aesthetics.)
  • Konstan, D. 2015. Beauty: The Fortunes of an Ancient Greek Idea. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • (A wide-ranging study of the ancient Greek conception of beauty; includes a discussion of translating problematic aesthetic terms.)
  • Laird, A. ed. 2006. Ancient Literary Criticism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • (A collection of papers covering a wide range of topics including Aristotle’s catharsis, the views of the Hellenistic schools on poetry and Plato’s treatment of tragedy.)
  • Lear, J. 1988. “Katharsis.” Phronesis 33: 297–326.
    • (An argument against the interpretation of catharsis as ‘purgation’ of emotions; and the suggestion that it is, instead, a psychological one with certain ethical connotations.)
  • Lear, G. R. 2006. “Aristotle on Moral Virtue and the Fine.” In The Blackwell Guide to Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, ed. R.Kraut, pp.116–136. Malden, MA; Oxford: Blackwell.
    • (A study of Aristotle’s use of to kalon with the argument that Aristotle used this term (with its aesthetic undertones) to put an emphasis on certain properties of goodness, namely, intelligibility and pleasantness to contemplate.)
  • Lobsien V. and C. Olk, eds. 2007. Neuplatonismus und Ästhetik: zur Transformationsgeschichte des Schönen. Berlin/New York: De Gruyter.
    • (A collection of papers on Neoplatonist aesthetics.)
  • Lombardo, G. 2002. L’Estetica Antica. Bologna: Il Mulino.
    • (A short monograph in Italian containing a discussion of views on aesthetics espoused by both major and lesser-known philosophical figures in antiquity.)
  • Nehamas, A. 2007. “‘Only in the Contemplation of Beauty is Human Life Worth Living’ Plato, Symposium 211d.” European Journal of Philosophy 15 (1): 1–18.
    • (A discussion of the role that beauty plays in Plato’s Symposium.)
  • Nussbaum, M. 1990. Love's Knowledge: Essays on Philosophy and Literature. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • (The relevant sections of this book analyze the complex relationship between philosophy and literature in Plato’s works.)
  • Pappas, N. 2012. “Plato on Poetry: Imitation or Inspiration?” Philosophy Compass 7 (10): 669–678.
    • (An argument that in Republic and Sophist, poetry is treated as imitation, whereas in Ion and Phaedrus, it is treated as inspiration. The relationship between the two views is explained by employing Plato’s concept of drama in Laws.)
  • Peponi, A. -E. 2012. Frontiers of Pleasure: Models of Aesthetic Response in Archaic and Classical Greek Thought. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • (A study of the representations of aesthetic properties of artworks and other objects in ancient Greek texts, including philosophical ones.)
  • Pollitt, J. J. 1974. The Ancient View of Greek Art: Criticism, History, and Terminology. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
    • (A seminal work on ancient Greek philosophy of art, it deals with not only philosophical but also literary, rhetorical and other kinds of texts.)
  • Porter J. 2009. “Is Art Modern? Kristeller’s ‘Modern System of the Arts’ Reconsidered.” British Journal of Aesthetics 49: 1–24.
    • (An article containing a critique of Kristeller’s dismissal of the possibility of ancient aesthetics.)
  • Porter, J. 2010. The Origins of Aesthetic Thought in Ancient Greece: Matter, Sensation and Experience. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • (The central argument claims that Plato and Aristotle established formalist aesthetics, which dominated the tradition and silenced alternative, materialist aesthetics.)
  • Porter, J. 2016. The Sublime in Antiquity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • (A study of the notion of sublime outside Longinus’ treatise.)
  • Rogers, K. 1993. “Aristotle's Conception of τὸ καλόν.” Ancient Philosophy 13:355–71. Reprinted in L. P. Gerson (ed.) 1999. Aristotle: Critical Assessments, iv. London: Routledge: 337–55.
    • (The analysis and interpretation Aristotle’s use of the term to kalon, especially his claim that virtues are undertaken for the sake of to kalon.)
  • Sheffield, F. 2006. Plato's ‘Symposium’: The Ethics of Desire. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • (A monograph on Plato’s Symposium; the central argument interprets the dialogue as concerned with moral education, but in a distinct way, that is, by means of the analysis of desire.)
  • Tatarkiewicz, W. 1974. The History of Aesthetics. Vol. 1. The Hague: Mouton.
    • (A collection of ancient Greek philosophical texts on various topics in aesthetics accompanied by a commentary.)
  • Zagdoun, M. -A. 2000. La Philosophie Stoïcienne de l’art. Paris: CNRS Editions.
    • (An extensive study of the notions of beauty and art in Stoic philosophy.)


Author Information

Aiste Celkyte
Yonsei University
South Korea