Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Ancient Ethics and Modern Morality

It is commonly supposed that there is a vital difference between ancient ethics and modern morality. For example, there appears to be a vital difference between virtue ethics and the modern moralities of deontological ethics (Kantianism) and consequentialism (utilitarianism). At second glance, however, one acknowledges that both ethical approaches have more in common than their stereotypes may suggest. Oversimplification, fallacious interpretations, as well as a broad variation within a particular ethical theory make it in general harder to determine the real differences and similarities between ancient ethics and modern morality. But why should we bother about ancient ethics at all? What is the utility of comparing the strengths and weaknesses of the particular approaches? The general answer is that a proper understanding of the strengths and weaknesses of virtue ethics and modern moral theories can be used to overcome current ethical problems and to initiate fruitful developments in ethical reasoning and decision-making.

This article examines the differences and similarities between ancient ethics and modern morality by analysing and comparing their main defining features in order to show that the two ethical approaches are less distinct than one might suppose. The first part of the article outlines the main ethical approaches in Ancient Greek ethics by focusing on the Cynics, the Cyrenaics, Aristotle’s virtue ethics, the Epicureans, and the Stoics. This part also briefly outlines the two leading modern ethical approaches, that is, Kantianism and utilitarianism, in more general terms in order to provide a sufficient background. The second part provides a detailed table with the main defining features of the conflicting stereotypes of ancient ethics and modern morality. Three main issues – the good life versus the good action, the use of the term “moral ought,” and whether a virtuous person can act in a non-virtuous way – are described in more detail in the third part of the article in order to show that the differences have more in common than the stereotypes may initially suggest. The fourth part deals with the idea of the moral duty in ancient ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Ancient Ethics and Modern Morality
    1. Ethics and Morality
    2. Ancient Ethics
      1. The Cynics and the Cyrenaics – The Extremes
      2. The Peripatetic School – Aristotle’s Virtue Ethics
      3. Epicureanism and Stoicism
    3. Modern Morality
      1. Kantianism
      2. Utilitarianism
    4. The Up-shot
  2. The Table of Ancient Ethics and Modern Morality – A Comparison
  3. Ancient Ethics and Modern Morality – The Main Differences
    1. The Good Life versus the Good Action
    2. The Moral Ought
    3. Can a Virtuous Person Act in a Non-Virtuous Way?
  4. Special Problem: Kant and Aristotle – Moral Duty and For the Sake of the Noble
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Ancient Ethics and Modern Morality

There are at least two main criteria that each moral theory must fulfil: first, the criterion of justification (that is, the particular moral theory should not contain any contradictions) and, second, the criterion of applicability (that is, the particular moral theory should solve concrete problems and offer ethical orientation). However, many (traditional) moral theories are unable to meet the second criterion and simply fall short of the high demands of applied ethics to solve the complex moral problems of our times. Why is this the case? The main point is that the traditional moral theories are not sufficiently well equipped to deal with completely new problems such as issues concerning nuclear power, gene technology, and cloning and so forth. Therefore, there is constant interest in updating and enhancing a particular moral theory in order to make it compatible with the latest demands. Examples are neo-Aristotelians such as Hursthouse on abortion (1991) and on nature (2007), as well as neo-Kantians such as Regan on animals (1985), Korsgaard in general and in particular on animals and nature (1996), and Altman’s edited volume on the use and limits of Kant’s practical philosophy in applied ethics (2011). This is a difficult and often very complex process.

a. Ethics and Morality

When people talk about ethical approaches in Antiquity, they refer to these approaches by using the words “ancient ethics” rather than “ancient morality”. They talk about “virtue ethics” and not about “virtue morality”. But, why is this the case? The challenging question is, according to Annas (1992: 119-120), whether ancient scholars such as Plato and Aristotle as well as the Stoics and Epicureans are really talking about morality at all, since their main focus is limited to the agent’s happiness, which obviously “doesn’t sound much like morality” (119). Even if one acknowledges the fact that happiness means a satisfactory and well-lived life according to the ethical virtues and not only a happy moment or so, it still does not sound like morality. Furthermore, the general idea in virtue ethics, that the good of other people enters the scene by being a part of one’s own good and that, for example, the notion of justice is introduced as a character trait and not as the idea of the rights of others (see, Dworkin’s phrase, “rights as trumps”), makes it obvious that there is a systematic difference between the notions of ethics and morality. Ancient ethics is about living a good and virtuous life according to the ethical virtues, that is, to become a virtuous person, while the modern notion of morality is primarily focused on the interests of other people and the idea of deontological constraints. That is, one acts morally because one has to meet certain standards and not because it supports one’s own good life. But even this simple picture might be premature depending on how one conceives the idea of “moral motivation” in ancient ethics (see, below).

Historically speaking, from a different perspective, there is no evidence which term is most legitimate. In Ancient Greek history, the Greek term for ethics is êthos and means something like character. When Aristotle analyses the good life in the Nicomachean Ethics and the Eudemian Ethics, he therefore focuses on the central topic of good and bad character traits that is virtues and vices. In this original sense, ethics means an analysis about the character or character traits. In Ancient Roman thought, which was essentially influenced by Cicero, the Greek term ethikos (the adjective to êthos) was translated with the Latin term moralis (the adjective of mores) whereas the Latin term mores, in fact, means habits and customs. It is possible to translate the Greek term êthos with habits and customs, but it is more likely that the translation of ethikos with moralis was a mistranslation. The term moralis rather refers to the Greek ethos whose primary meaning is habits and customs. If the term morality refers to mores, then the term morality means the totality of all habits and customs of a given community. The term moralis became a terminus technicus in the Latin-shaped philosophy, which covers the present meaning of the term. In modern times, the habits and customs of a given community are termed ‘conventions’, which are authoritative for the social life in society. Morality, however, is not simply a matter of mere convention but the latter often conflicts with morality (for example, an immoral convention), hence, it seems inappropriate to shorten the term in this way (Steinfath 2000). At present, there are, at least, four different possibilities to distinguish between ethics and morality:

  1. Ethics and morality as distinct spheres: Ethics has to do with the pursuit of one’s own happiness or well-being and private lifestyle, that is, how we should live to make good lives for ourselves. Morality has to do with other people’s interests and deontological constraints (for example Jürgen Habermas).
  2. The equation of ethics and morality (for example Peter Singer).
  3. Morality as a special field in the ethical realm: Ethics is the generic term for ethical and moral issues in the above-mentioned sense. Morality is a special part of ethics (for example, Bernard Williams).
  4. Morality as the object of ethics: Ethics is the philosophical theory of morality which is the systematic analysis of moral norms and values (standard reading).

The upshot is that it is always important to ask how the terms ethics and morality are used and how one uses them for oneself. It is certain that one makes a textual and not only a conceptual differentiation by claiming that the terms differ.

b. Ancient Ethics

It is impossible to give a complete depiction of the rich history of ethical reasoning and decision-making in Antiquity here, therefore the focus of this section concerns the main lines of ethical reasoning of the most important philosophical schools in the classic and Hellenistic period. This rather simplified overview is nonetheless sufficient for our purposes. One can roughly distinguish the classic and Hellenistic periods into four different but closely connected parts. The first part concerns Socrates and his arguments with the Sophists (second half of the fifth century BC); the second part covers the post-Socratian formation of important philosophical schools deeply influenced by Socratic thought for example Antisthenes’ school of the Cynics, Aristippus’ school of the Cyrenaics, and Plato’s Academy which is the most influential ancient school (second half of the fifth and fourth centuries BC). The third part is characterized, on the one hand, by the formation of one new major philosophical school, namely Aristotle’s peripatetic school, which developed from Plato’s Academy, and, on the other hand, by the exchange of arguments among the existing schools on various issues (fourth century BC). The fourth part concerns the formation of two new important philosophical schools, which become highly influential in Antiquity, first, Epicurus’ school of epicureanism standing in the tradition of the Cyrenaics and, secondly, Zeno’s school of the Stoics which partly developed from the Cynics (second half of the fourth and third century BC). All the philosophical schools – being at odds with each other – are still united by the fact that they are deeply concerned with the most important ethical questions of how to live a good life and how to achieve happiness. Their responses to these vital questions are, of course, diverse.

ancient and modern ethics Figure 1

Figure 1. The Most Prominent Philosophical Schools in Ancient Greece

The following brief depiction focuses on the basic ethical assumptions of the philosophical schools of the Cynics and Cyrenaics, the peripatetic school, the Epicureans, and the Stoics. Socrates and Plato’s Academy are left out by virtue that Socrates did not provide any (written) systematic ethics. His unsystematic ethical position is mainly depicted in Plato’s early dialogues, for example Laches, Charmides, Protagoras and some of Xenophon’s works, such as Apology, Symposium, and Memorabilia. Plato himself did not provide any systematic ethics comparable to the other main ancient schools either, even though one can certainly reconstruct – at least to some extent – his ethical viewpoint in the dialogue Politeia. In addition, most (ethical) works of the classic and Hellenistic periods are lost in the dark of history; what remains is a collection of fragments, phrases, and (parts of) letters of various important philosophers (and commentators) standing in the tradition of particular schools at that time. Many rival views on ethics are mediated through the works of Plato and Aristotle, in which they criticize their opponents. In addition, some of these rudiments and testimonials were also mediated by famous writers and politicians such as Xenophon (fifth and fourth century BC) and the important historian of philosophy Diogenes Laertios (third century AD). Aristotle, however, is the only ancient philosopher whose two substantial and complete ethical contributions, that is, the Nicomachean Ethics and the Eudemian Ethics – leaving aside the Magna Moralia of which the authorship is unclear – have survived, even though all of his dialogues including those that are concerned with ethics and ethical issues are also lost.

i. The Cynics and the Cyrenaics – The Extremes

The founder of the school of the Cynics, Antisthenes of Athens, taught that virtue in terms of practical wisdom is a good and also sufficient for eudaimonia, that is, happiness. Badness is an evil and everything else is indifferent. In accord with Socrates, Antisthenes claimed that virtue is teachable and he also accepted the doctrine of the unity of the virtues which is the general idea that if a person possesses one ethical virtue, then he or she thereby possesses all other ethical virtues as well (for a recent contribution to this controversial doctrine, see Russell, 2009). The only good of human beings is that what is peculiar to them, that is, their ability to reason. Against the Cyrenaics he argues that pleasure is never a good. Things such as death, illness, servitude, poverty, disgrace, and hard labour are only supposed to be bad but are not real evils. One should be indifferent towards one’s honour, property, liberty, health and life (committing suicide was allowed). The Cynics, in general, lived a beggar’s life and were probably the first real cosmopolitans in human history – a feature that the Stoics wholeheartedly adopted later. They were also against the common cultural and religious rites and practices, a main feature which they shared with the Sophists. They took Socratian frugality to extremes and tried to be as independent of material goods as possible, like Diogenes of Sinope who lived in a barrel. Furthermore, one should abstain from bad things and seek apathy and tranquillity, which are important features the Stoics adopted from the Cynics as well. According to the Cynics, there are two groups of people: first, the wise people living a perfect and happy life – they cannot lose their virtues once they achieved this condition (similar to Aristotle) – and, secondly, the fools who are unhappy and make mistakes (Diogenes Laertios VI, 1 and 2; Zeller 1883: 116-121; Long 2007: 623-629).

Aristippus of Cyrene was well known and highly regarded among philosophers in Antiquity and was the first Socratian disciple who took money in exchange for lessons. He was the founder of the Cyrenaics – a famous philosophical school whose members were devoted to (sensualistic) hedonism (which certainly influenced Jeremy Bentham’s version of hedonistic utilitarianism). Thereby, the school of the Cyrenaics stands in striking contrast to the Cynics. Aristippus claims that knowledge is valuable only insofar as it is useful in practical matters (a feature that the Cyrenaics share with the Cynics); all actions should strive for the utmost pleasure since pleasure is the highest good. There are gradual qualitative differences of the goods. Unlike Aristotle the Hedonists believed that happiness understood as a long-term state is not the overall purpose in life but the bodily pleasure of the very moment, which is the goal of life. The past has gone by and the future is uncertain therefore only the here and now is decisive since the immediate feelings are the only guide to what is really genuinely valuable. Practical wisdom is the precondition of happiness in being instrumentally useful for achieving pleasure. Aristippus and the Cyrenaics were seeking maximum pleasure in each moment without being swamped by it. Aristippus – known for his cheerful nature and praiseworthy character as well as his distinguished restraint – famously claimed that one should be the master in each moment: “I possess, but I am not possessed”. A. A. Long rightly claims: “Aristippus Senior had served as the paradigm of a life that was both autonomous and effortlessly successful in turning circumstances into sources of bodily enjoyment” (2007: 636). Aristippus was a true master in making the best out of each situation; he also taught that one should be able to limit one’s wishes if they are likely to cause severe problems for oneself, to preserve self-control (a general feature he shares with Socrates), to secure one’s happiness, to seek inner freedom, and to be cheerful. Obviously his teachings of a life solely devoted to bodily pleasure – that is, his pursuit of lust and his view concerning the unimportance of knowledge – stand in striking contrast to Socrates’ teachings (as well as to Plato and Aristotle). His disciples – most notably Aristippus the Younger, Theodoros, Anniceris (who bought the release of Plato), and Hegesias – established new Cyrenaic schools offering sophisticated versions of hedonism by virtue of fruitful disputes with Epicurus and the Cynics (for a brief overview on Aristippus’ disciples, see A. A. Long 2007: 632-639 and for the teachings, for example, Diogenes Laertios II, 8; Zeller 1883: 121-125; Döring 1988. For the view that Aristippus’ hedonism is not limited to “bodily pleasures”, see Urstad 2009).

ii. The Peripatetic School – Aristotle’s Virtue Ethics      

Aristotle proposed the most prominent and sophisticated version of virtue ethics in Antiquity and his teachings have become authoritative for many scholars and still remain alive in the vital contributions of neo-Aristotelians in contemporary philosophy. His main ethical work is the Nicomachean Ethics; less prominent but still valuable and authentic is the Eudemian Ethics while Aristotle’s authorship of the Magna Moralia is highly questionable. Aristotle claims that happiness (eudaimonia) is the highest good – that is the final, perfect, and self-contained goal – to which all people strive at. In particular, happiness is the goal of life, that is, a life that is devoted to “doing” philosophy (EN X, 6–9). Whether a person can be called “happy” can only be determined at the very end of a person’s life, retrospectively. For a good and general overview on Aristotle’s ethics see Broadie (1991) and Wolf (2007).

However, the idea that life should be devoted to reasoning follows from Aristotle’s important human function argument (EN I, 5, 6) in which he attempts to show – by analogy – that human beings as such must also have a proper function in comparison to other things such as a pair of scissors (the proper function is to cutting) and a flute player (the proper function is to flute playing) and so forth. If the proper function is performed in a good way, then Aristotle claims that the particular thing has goodness (aretê). For example, if the proper function of a pair of scissors is to cutting, then the proper function of a good pair of scissors is to cutting well (likewise in all other cases). Since the proper function of human beings – according to Aristotle – is to reason, the goodness of human beings depends on the good performance of the proper human function that is to reason well. In fact, Aristotle claims that the goodness of human beings does not consist in the mere performance of the proper function but rather in their disposition. This claim is substantiated by his example of the good person and the bad person who cannot be distinguished from each other during their bedtime if one only refers to their (active) performance. The only possible way to distinguish them is to refer to their different dispositions. It is a matter of debate whether there is a particular human function as proposed by Aristotle.

All in all, one can distinguish four different lines of reasoning in Aristotle’s ethics: the virtue of the good person (standard interpretation), the idea of an action-oriented virtue ethics, the application of practical wisdom, and the idea of the intrinsic value of virtues. The different approaches are dealt with in order.

The virtue of the good person (EN II, 3, 4): according to Aristotle, an action is good (or right) if a virtuous person would perform that action in a similar situation; an action is bad or wrong (and hence prohibited) if the virtuous person would never perform such an action. Three criteria must be met, according to Aristotle, in order to ensure that an action is virtuous given that the agent is in a certain condition when he performs them: (i.) the agent must have knowledge of the circumstances of the action (the action must not happen by accident); (ii.) the action is undertaken out of deliberative choice and is done for its own sake; and (iii.) the action is performed without hesitation, that is, the action is performed by a person with a firm and stable virtuous character.

The action-oriented virtue ethics (EN II, 6, 1107a10–15): Aristotle’s virtue ethics contains some hints that he not only adheres to the standard interpretation, but also claims that there are some actions that are always morally blameworthy under any circumstances, that is, some actions are intrinsically bad. The fine or the noble and the just require the virtuous person to do or refrain from doing certain things, for example, not to murder (in particular, not to kill one’s parents), not to commit adultery, and not to commit theft. This line of reasoning contains deontological limitations insofar as the virtuous person is no longer the overall standard of evaluation, but the virtuous person herself must meet some ethical criteria in order to fulfil the external demands of, for example, “the noble” and “the just” to act virtuously.

Practical wisdom (EN VI): in some passages in book VI of the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle argues that it is our practical wisdom that makes our practical considerations good, both with regard to the good or virtuous life and with regard to our particular goals. He claims that a practically wise person has a special sensitivity or special perceptual skill with which to evaluate a situation in a morally correct or appropriate way. Here, the emphasis lies on the practical wisdom – as the capacity of ethical reasoning and decision-making – rather than on adhering to single ethical virtues, even though Aristotle claims that it is impossible to be practically wise without having ethical virtues and vice versa.

The intrinsic value of the virtues: following the standard interpretation of the role of the ethical virtues with regard to living a good life, Aristotle argues in the Nicomachean Ethics (EN X, 6–9) that these virtues are somewhat less important when it comes to the overall goal, that is, happiness of living a good life. The primary goal is to live a life devoted to “doing” philosophy and thereby living a good life; the secondary goal is to live a life among other people which makes it necessary to adopt the ethical virtues, as well.

iii. Epicureanism and Stoicism

Epicurus – educated by the Platonist Pamphilus and highly influenced by the important teachings of Democritus – developed his philosophical school of the Epicureans in controversies with the Cyrenaics and the Stoics and meeting their objections and challenges. The lively exchange of arguments concerning the vital issue of how to live a good life put Epicurus in the position to successfully articulate a refined and sophisticated version of hedonism, which was regarded as superior to the rival philosophical school of the Cyrenaics. He claims that sensation is the only standard of measuring good and evil. Epicurus shares the view with the Cyrenaics that all living beings strive for pleasure and try to avoid pain. But, unlike the Cyrenaic school, he argues that happiness consists of not only the very moment of bodily pleasure but lasts a whole life and also contains mental pleasure, which is – according to him – preferable to bodily pleasure. In his Letter to Menoceus, Epicurus comments on flawed views of his ethical position and claims: “For what produces the pleasant life is not continuous drinking and parties or pederasty or womanizing or the enjoyment of fish and the other dishes of an expensive table, but sober reasoning […]” (Epic. EP. Men. 132, in: Long and Sedley 2011: 114).  The ultimate goal in life is not to strive for positive pleasure but to seek for absence of pain. Unlike Aristippus, Epicurus claims in support of the importance of mental states that bodily pleasure and pain is limited to the here and now, while the soul is also concerned with the pleasurable and painful states of the past and prospective pleasure and pain. Thus, sensations based on recollections, hope and fear in the context of mental states with regard to the past and future are much stronger than the bodily pleasure of the moment. Being virtuous is a precondition of tranquillity, that is, peace and freedom from fear, which is closely connected to happiness. In addition, Epicurus taught that one should free oneself from prejudices, to master and restrict one’s desires, to live a modest life (for example a life not devoted to achieve glory and honour), which does not exclude bodily pleasure, and to cultivate close friendships, for which the Epicureans were well known (see, Diogenes Laertios X, 1; Zeller 1883: 263-267; Erler and Schofield 2007: 642-674; Long and Sedley 2000: §20-§25).

Shortly after the rise of epicureanism, Zeno of Citium – the founder of stoicism – established a new school in Athens. The members were well known for their cosmopolitism that is the idea that all human beings belong to a single community that should be cultivated (quite similar to Aristippus’ view and the Stoics), their self-contained life style and deep concern for friendship as well as their strong adherence to ataraxia that is the freedom from passions such as pleasure, desires, sorrow, and fear which jeopardize the inner independence. The Stoics were influenced by teachings of the Cynics. Human beings, according to stoicism, are able to perceive the laws of nature through reason and to act accordingly. The best life is a life according to nature (Zeller 1883: 243). Zeno believed that the most general instinct is the instinct of self-preservation; for each living being the only thing that is valuable is what conduces to the being’s self-preservation and thereby contributes to the being’s happiness. For example, in the case of rational beings only what is in accord with reason is valuable; only virtue, which is necessary and sufficient for happiness, is a good. Following the Cynics, the Stoics argue that honour, property, health and life are not goods and that poverty, disgrace, illness, and death are not evils. Against the Cyrenaics and Epicureans, they hold the view that pleasure is not a good and certainly not the highest good; they agree with Aristotle that pleasure is the consequence of our actions – if they are of the right kind – but not the goal itself. Two main doctrines are of utmost importance in the teachings of stoicism, first, the significance of ataraxia and, secondly, the idea of doing what nature demands. First, happiness is ataraxia – the freedom from passions – and a self-contained life style. Secondly, the idea that one must act in accordance with one’s own nature in terms of acting virtuously stands in striking contrast to the other philosophical schools at that time. In addition, the right motif transforms the performance of one’s duty into a virtuous action, completely independent of the outcome of the particular action (an important feature that we find again in Kant’s ethics). Following Socrates and Plato, the Stoics believed that virtue is ethical knowledge and that non-virtuous people simply lack ethical knowledge, since virtue consists in the reasonable condition of the soul, which leads to correct views. The Cynic idea of the sharp distinction between the existence of a very few wise people and many fools, that is all non-wise people, had become less sharp in the process of time. In addition, the Roman philosopher and politician Cicero (106–43 BC) is the first author whose work on the notion of duty survives, De Officiis, in which he examined the notion in great detail in the first century BC (44 BC). It should be noted, however, that the stoic philosopher Panaitios of Rhodes (180–110 BC) had already published an important book on the notion of duty prior to Cicero. Panaitios’ work is lost but we know some essential ideas from it mediated through Cicero since he often refers to Panaitios in his De Officiis. Stoicism outlived the other philosophical schools with regard to its ethics by being an attractive position for many people and leading philosophers and politicians such as Seneca (first century AD) and Marcus Aurelius (second century AD) in Ancient Rome. (see, Diogenes Laertios VII, 1; Zeller 1883: 243-253; Inwood and Donini 2007: 675-738; Long and Sedley 2000: §56-§67).

c. Modern Morality

The two main moral theories of modern virtue ethics (or neo-Aristotelianism) are Kant’s deontological ethics and utilitarianism. Both theories have been adopted and modified by many scholars in recent history in order to make them (more) compatible with the latest demands in ethical reasoning and decision-making, in particular, by meeting the objections raised by modern virtue ethics. The following briefly depicts Kantianism in its original form and the main features of utilitarianism.

i. Kantianism

The German philosopher Immanuel Kant is the founder of deontological ethics. His ethics, which he mainly put forth in the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785), Critique of Practical Reason (1788), and Metaphysics of Morals (1797), is one of the most prominent and highly respected theories in modernity. Kant’s ethics is deontological in the sense that one has to obey the duties and obligations which derive from his supreme principle of morality, that is, the Categorical Imperative: “Act only according to that maxim whereby you can at the same time will that it should become a universal law” (Kant 1785). The Categorical Imperative is a test for maxims which, in turn, determine whether certain acts have moral worth or not. A maxim is an individual’s subjective principle or rule of the will (in German, das subjektive Prinzip des Wollen), which tells the individual what to do in a given particular situation. If the maxim can be universalized, then it is valid and one must act upon it. A maxim cannot be universalized when it faces two severe instances: (i.) the case of logical inconsistency (the example of suicide, which is against the “perfect duty”); and, (ii.) the case of impossibility to will the maxim to be universalized (failing to cultivate one’s talents, which is against the “imperfect duty”). Perfect duties are those duties that are blameworthy if they are not met by human beings (for example the suicide example); imperfect duties allow for human desires and hence they are not as strong as perfect duties but they are still morally binding and people do not attract blame if they do not complete them (for example failing to cultivate one’s talents). Kant’s ethics is universal in the sense that the system of moral duties and obligations point at all rational beings (not only human beings). Morality is not based in interests (such as social contract theories), emotions and intuitions, or conscience, but in reason alone. This is the reason why Kant’s ethics is not heteronomous – by being a divine ethical theory in which God commands what human beings should do (for example the Bible, the Ten Commandments) or natural law conception in which nature itself commands what human beings should do by providing human beings with the faculty of reason who, in turn, detect what should be done in moral matters – but truly autonomous with regard to rational beings, who make their moral decisions in the light of pure practical reason. However, pure practical reason, in determining the moral law or Categorical Imperative, determines what ought to be done without reference to empirical contingent factors (that is, anthropology in the broad sense of the term including the empirical sciences; see preface to Groundwork) such as one’s own desires or any personal inclinations (in German Neigungen). The pure practical reason is not limited to the particular nature of human reasoning but is the source and the field of universal norms, which stem from a general notion of a rational being as such (see, Eisler 2008: 577; Paton 1967; Timmermann 2010; Altman 2011).

ii. Utilitarianism

Historically speaking, Jeremy Bentham in his Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation (1789) and John Stuart Mill in Utilitarianism (1863) are the founders of utilitarianism, while Francis Hutcheson (1755) and William Paley (1785) could be seen as their legitimate predecessors by pointing out that utility should be seen as an important standard of evaluation in ethical reasoning and decision-making. Bentham claims that the duration and intensity of pleasure and pain are of utmost importance and that it is even possible – according to Bentham – to measure the right action by applying a hedonistic calculus which determines the exact utility of the actions. The action with the best hedonistic outcome should be put into practice. His position is called radical quantitative hedonism. Mill instead questions the very idea of a hedonistic calculus and argues that one must distinguish between mental and bodily pleasure by giving more weight to mental pleasures. His position is called qualitative hedonism. Mill’s basic formula of utilitarianism is as follows:

The creed which accepts as the foundation of morals, Utility, or the Greatest Happiness Principle, holds that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness. By happiness is intended pleasure, and the absence of pain; by unhappiness, pain and the privation of pleasure. (Mill’s Utilitarianism, chapter 2)

There is widespread agreement that there exist numerous different utilitarian theories in modern ethics; hence it would be impossible to provide an adequate depiction of all important major strands in this brief subsection. However, the following four main aspects are typical for each utilitarian theory. (1.) The consequence principle: Utilitarianism is not about actions but about the consequences of actions. This kind of theory is a form of consequentialism, which means that the moral worth of the particular action is determined by its outcome. (2.) Happiness: Utilitarianism is a teleological theory insofar as happiness (but, not in the ancient sense of the term) is the main goal that should be achieved. This particular goal can be identified with (i.) the promotion of pleasure, (ii.) the avoidance of pain or harm, (iii.) the fulfilment of desires or considered preferences, or (iv.) with meeting some objective criteria of well-being. (3.) Greatest Happiness Principle: Utilitarianism is not about mere happiness but about “the greatest happiness” attainable. Utilitarianism is a theory with one principle that judges the consequences of a given action regarding its utility, which is the general aim of actions. The moral rightness or wrongness of actions depends on the goal of achieving the greatest happiness for the greatest number of sentient beings, in short, “the greatest happiness for the greatest number”. (4.) Maximising: The collective amount of utility regarding sentient beings affected by the action should be maximized. This line of reasoning contains strong altruistic claims because, roughly speaking, one should only choose those actions which improve other sentient beings’ happiness.

Furthermore, one major methodological distinction should be mentioned briefly since it really divides all utilitarian theories in two different groups by either applying the principle of utility to actions or rules. In act utilitarianism (or direct utilitarianism) the principle of utility is applied to the particular action; in this case, one asks whether the action in question is morally right or wrong in this particular situation. In rule utilitarianism (or indirect utilitarianism), instead, the principle of utility is applied to rules only which, in turn, are applied to the particular actions and serve as guidelines for human behaviour in order to guarantee the greatest happiness for the greatest number. Here, the vital question is whether a specific rule maximises the general utility or not. From time to time, it happens that the general utility will be maximised by rule utilitarianism to a lesser degree than it would have been the case regarding act utilitarianism. For example, one should act according to the general rule which says that one should keep one’s promises which – in the long run – maximises the general utility (rule utilitarianism). However, in some cases it would be better to adhere to act utilitarianism since it maximises the general utility to a higher degree depending on the particular situation and circumstances of the case in question (act utilitarianism).

d. The Up-shot

The depiction of the ethical views of some important philosophical schools as well as their interrelatedness in Antiquity and the outline of the two leading moral theories in modern morality show that there is – despite the systematic difference concerning the importance of the question of the good life – a significant overlap of important lines of reasoning. In addition, the supposed distinction between ancient ethics and modern morality contains many misleading claims. Socrates can be seen as the initial ignition of a broad variety of diverse virtue ethical approaches such as cynicism, the teachings of the Cyrenaics, Aristotelianism, epicureanism, and stoicism. All philosophical schools were concerned with the vital questions of how to live a good life and how to achieve happiness by pointing out what the appropriate actions were. The brief outline of the different philosophical schools in Antiquity supports this view. Modern morality is different in that its focus is on the basic question of how one should act. The ancient question of how should one live is secondary. However, modern morality in particular Kantianism and utilitarianism did not start from scratch but already had some important and highly influential ancient predecessors. For example, the Kantian idea of doing the right thing because reason dictates it has its roots in stoicism (see, Cooper 1998, Schneewind 1998) and the utilitarian idea of living a happy life according to pleasure has its roots in the teachings of the Cyrenaics (for example Bentham 1789) and Epicureans (for example Mill 1863). The history of ideas conveyed important ethical insights handed down from Antiquity to modernity. The idea that there is a clear and easy distinction between ancient (virtue) ethics and modern moral theories is premature and misleading. Indeed, there are some important differences but one must acknowledge the simple fact that there is no unity or broad consensus among ancient virtue ethicists concerning the question of how to live a good life and which actions should count as virtuous. Hence, it follows that there is no “ancient ethics” as such but many important and diverse virtue ethical approaches, which have either more or less in common with “modern morality”.

In addition, modern morality, in particular contemporary morality, is characterized by the fact that quite a few important scholars elaborated modern versions of Aristotle’s classical virtue ethics in the twentieth century. These scholars argue that virtue ethics was quite successful in solving ethical problems in Antiquity and they believe that adhering to a refined version of virtue ethics is not only useful but also superior in solving our modern moral problems. Among the most important neo-Aristotelian scholars are Anscombe (1958), Foot (1978, 2001), Hursthouse (1999), MacIntyre (1981), Nussbaum (1992, 1993, 1995), Slote (2001), Swanton (2003), and Williams (1985) who claim that the traditional ethical theories such as deontological ethics (Kantianism) and consequentialism (utilitarianism) are doomed to failure. In general they adhere, at least, to two main hypotheses: (i.) People in Antiquity already employed a very efficient way of ethical reasoning and decision-making; and, (ii.) this particular way got lost in modernity without having been properly replaced. Hence it follows that one should overcome the deficient modern ethical theories and again adhere to virtue ethics as a viable alternative without, of course, abandoning the existing ethical developments (see Bayertz 2005: 115).

The following section depicts the old but still persisting stereotypical differences between ancient ethics and modern morality in order to further deepen our understanding about the supposed and real differences and similarities of both ethical approaches.

2. The Table of Ancient Ethics and Modern Morality – A Comparison

This self-explanatory table presents a simple but instructive comparison of the defining features of the stereotypes of ancient ethics and modern morality (for a similar table see Bayertz 2005: 117).

No. Criteria Ancient Ethics Modern Morality
1. Basic Question  What is the good life? What is happiness and human flourishing? What should one/I do? The question of the good life plays, at best, a sub-ordinate role.
2. What is the Object of Concern?  Self-centred: The person’s own interests dominate. Other-related: The interests of other people are most central.
3. What is most important?  Pursuit of Goals: Personal perfection, personal projects, and personal relationships. Universal moral obligations & rules: Individuals should seek for impartiality (and hence they alienate themselves from their own personal projects).
4. What is examined?  Agent: Most important are the acting person and his/her character (agent-centred ethics). Actions & Consequences: Most important is the correctness of the action & consequence (action & consequences centred ethics).
5. Central Notions  Virtues: aretaic notions for example good, excellence, virtue (aretaic language). Norms: prescriptive notions concerning rules, duties, obligations for example must, should (deontic language).
6. Rationality is seen as?  Rationality is seen as a capacity of context-sensitive insight and decision-making. Rationality is “mainly” seen as the capacity to (rationally) deduce inferences from abstract propositions.
7. The Goals of human actions  The goals of human actions are objective (notion of happiness: for example thinking, pleasure). The goals of human actions are individually defined by the people (subjectivism). No God, no nature.
8.  Scope of Morality Adult male citizens with full citizenship. Men, women, children, animals, environment.
9.  Individual and Community The individual is in unity with the community (harmony). The individual and the community are rather disconnected from each other.

Table 1: Ancient Ethics and Modern Morality

3. Ancient Ethics and Modern Morality – The Main Differences

a. The Good Life versus the Good Action

The most common stereotype with regard to ancient ethics and modern morality concerns the vital issue that ancient ethics is only about the question “What is the good life” and that modern moral theories only deal with the question “What should one do” or “How should one act”. Many stereotypes certainly depict some truth, but there is almost always a lot of room for a better understanding of the differences and similarities of the particular issue. To be more precise with regard to this issue, it is true that ancient ethics concerns the vital question of how to live a good life and to become a virtuous person by acting in accordance with the ethical virtues. However, the idea that virtue ethics does not deal with actions and hence is unable to provide concrete answers to ethical problems is premature; it is not only modern moral theories that deal with actions (see, Hursthouse 1999, chapters 1-3; Slote 2001, chapter 1; Swanton 2003, chapter 11). An ethical virtue, according to Aristotle, needs to be completely internalized by its agent through many actions of the same type so that the person is able to accomplish a firm disposition. In other words, a brave person who has the virtue of courage has to perform many brave actions in the area of fear and confidence in order to accomplish a brave disposition. Performing the appropriate actions is the only way one can do this. Indeed, modern moral theories are rather focused on the question of what should one do in a particular situation, and usually ethicists do not pay much attention to the question of living a good life. Ancient ethicists, instead, believe that one cannot separate both issues.

A related issue that seems to strongly support the initial idea concerns the claim that, on the one hand, ancient ethics is self-centred because it only focuses on the agent’s interests in living a good life and becoming a virtuous person and, on the other hand, that modern morality is other-regarding by only focusing on the interests of other people. Broadly speaking, ancient ethics is egoistical and modern morality is altruistic. The interests of other people in virtue ethics enter the stage by being incorporated into the person’s own interest in becoming virtuous and living a good life. In her article Ancient Ethics and Modern Morality, Annas examines this point in more detail and claims “the confusion comes from the thought that if the good of others is introduced into the agent’s own final good, it cannot really be the good of others, but must in some way be reduced to what matters to the agent”.  She points out that the confusion might be that “the good of others must matter to me because it is the good of others, not because it is part of my own good” (Annas 1992: 131). Annas thinks that this is compatible with the overall final good of the virtuous person since the good of others matters to the virtuous person not because it is part of the agent’s own good but because it is the good of others.

Other people, however, might claim that the difference is between “morality” and “legality”, to use a Kantian distinction. In this context, legality means simply to fulfil the moral claims that other people have; morality means to fulfil the moral claims that other people have and, in addition, to have the right motive in doing so, that is, to act out of “the good will” – to act out of a sense of moral obligation or duty. Translated into “ancient” language, the virtuous person should consider other people’s interests not because she feels indifferent to them or because their interests are only instrumentally useful to her as agent, but because the virtuous person wholeheartedly believes, feels, and acknowledges the fact that the other people’s interests are important in their own right. Another example is Aristotle who believes that the good person is living a good life if and only if she devotes her life to “philosophy” and, secondarily, lives a social life among other people. The latter requires the usage of ethical virtues, which are by nature other-regarding; the former does not require the usage of ethical virtues (see, Aristotle EN X, 6–9), even though, according to Aristotle, one cannot be a practically wise person without being virtuous, and vice versa. Both concepts are mutually dependent (EN VI).

One might claim that self-interest and the interests of other people do not stand in contrast to each other in ancient ethics but converge by adhering to an objective idea of the good (see, Bayertz 2005). The line between moral questions that concern the interests of other people and ethical questions that concern the well-being of the particular agent is disfigured beyond recognition. In modern morality, however, there is a clear difference because the question of the good life is secondary, and is systematically not important for the question of how one should act in a particular situation. Modern moral theories are rather subjective in character and hence lack the strong commitments of virtue ethical theories concerning their objective basis, as well as their claims regarding elitism and the devaluation of the moral common sense. The upshot is, however, that there is a systematic difference between ancient ethics and modern morality concerning the way in which moral problems are solved, but the idea that ancient ethics is egoistic and does not appeal to actions is premature and simply wrong.

b. The Moral Ought

Anscombe points out in her classical paper Modern Moral Philosophy (1958) that modern morality is doomed to failure because it only focuses on the analysis of language and notions and, in particular, it adheres to the fallacious idea of the moral duty. She argues that the idea of the moral duty and the moral ought used in deontological ethics originally comes from religious reasoning and theological ethics, where God was the ultimate source of morality and where the people had to obey God’s commands. Here, the ideas of a moral duty and a moral ought were appropriate. In secular ethics, however, there is no general consent to the idea of a moral duty that is universally binding on all rational people. The idea of a moral duty, according to Anscombe, should be replaced by the notion of virtue. Furthermore, Schopenhauer convincingly claims in his book On the Basis of Morality that even in the case of religious ethics there is no categorical moral duty, since people obey God’s moral rules simply because they do not want to be punished, if they decide not to act accordingly. But this means that the moral duty is hypothetical rather than categorical. It is commonly said that in ancient ethics there is no moral duty and no moral ought simply because the Greek and Romans lack those particular notions. However, from the bare fact that they lack the notions of moral duty and moral ought, one cannot conclude that they also lack the particular phenomena as well (Bayertz 2005: 122). In addition, one might claim that his point still misses the general idea of using similar notions as main ethical key terms, which reflects a certain particular way of ethical reasoning and decision-making. Whether there is something like a ‘moral ought’ in ancient virtue ethics that is comparable to deontological ethics will be briefly examined below by focusing on Aristotle’s ethics. 

c. Can a Virtuous Person Act in a Non-Virtuous Way?

According to ancient ethics, a completely virtuous person, who is the bearer of all ethical virtues, is unable to act in a non-virtuous way. If a person bears one virtue, he thereby bears all other virtues as well (that is the thesis of the unity of the virtues). The practically wise person – according to Ancient ethicists – will always act in accordance with the ethical virtues. In other words, the virtuous person is always master of her emotions and, in general, will never be swamped by her emotions, which otherwise might have led her to act in a non-virtuous way. Generally speaking, this is a quite demanding line of argumentation since it can be the case, at least according to our modern way of thinking, that a brave person who has the virtue of courage might not be able to show the virtue of liberality. However, even if one acknowledges that person A is a virtuous person, one might not be convinced that this person will never be able to act in a non-virtuous way. This particular problem has to do with the famous hypothesis of ‘the unity of the virtues’ (for a recent contribution to this problem, see Russell, 2009). In modern morality, utilitarianism, for example, convincingly distinguishes between the evaluation of the character of a person and his or her actions. It can easily be the case, according to utilitarianism, that a morally bad person performs a morally right action or that a morally good person performs a morally wrong action. This distinction is impossible to draw for proponents of (classic) virtue ethics because an ethically right action always presupposes that the person has an ethically good character.

4. Special Problem: Kant and Aristotle – Moral Duty and For the Sake of the Noble

There is a widely shared agreement among philosophers that Kant’s deontological ethics and Aristotle’s virtue ethics can be easily distinguished by acknowledging the simple fact that Kant is concerned with acting from duty or on the moral principle or because one thinks that it is morally right; while Aristotle’s approach completely lacks this particular idea of moral motivation and, hence, it would be unsound to claim that the virtuous person is morally obligated to act in a way similar to the Kantian agent. In other words, there is no such thing as acting from a sense of duty in virtue ethics. The common view has been challenged by, for example, neo-Aristotelians (for example Hursthouse 2010) who claim that there is not only a strong notion of moral motivation in Aristotle’s approach, but also that the virtuous person is better equipped to meet the demands of acting from a sense of duty than the Kantian moral agent. The following sketches out the main line of reasoning (see, also Engstrom and Whiting 1998; Jost and Wuerth 2011).

Hursthouse claims in her book On Virtue Ethics that “there is a growing enthusiasm for the idea that the ideal Kantian agent, the person with a good will, who acts “from a sense of duty”, and the ideal neo-Aristotelian agent, who acts from virtue – from a settled state of character – are not as different as they were once supposed to be” (2010: 140). Her view is supported by some important works of Hudson (1990), Audi (1995), and Baron (1995). This fact, however, has also been acknowledged by neo-Kantian philosophers such as Korsgaard (1998) and Herman (1998). In this respect it reflects a lack of awareness about current developments in virtue ethics and neo-Kantianism if one still up-holds the claim of the clear distinction between ancient ethics and modern morality, in particular, concerning Aristotle and Kant that has been proposed for hundreds of years. A related issue concerning the question of whether there is a fundamental distinction between aretaic and deontic terms has been critically discussed by Gryz (2011) who argues against Stocker (1973) who claims that “good” and “right” mean the same thing. Gryz is convinced that even if both groups of terms converge (as close as possible), there will still either remain an unbridgeable gap or in case that one attempts to define one group of terms by the other group, it follows that something is left behind which cannot be explained by the second group. This contemporary debate shows that there is still no common view on the relationship between ancient ethics and modern morality.

Kant claims in the Groundwork that the morally motivated agent acts from good will. In more detail, to act from duty or to act because one thinks that it is morally right is to perform an action because one thinks that its maxim has the form of a law (Korsgaard 1998: 218). For example, if a person is in need the Kantian agent does the right action not because – as Korsgaard claims – that it is her purpose to simply do her duty, but because the person chooses the action for its own sake that means her purpose is to help (Korsgaard 1998: 207).

Even if the Ancient Greeks lacked the particular notions that can be translated as moral ought, duty, right, and principle (for example Gryz 2011, Hursthouse 2010), it seems nonetheless correct to claim that the idea of doing the right thing because it is right or because one is required to do it is also a well-known phenomenon in classic virtue ethics in general and with regard to Aristotle and stoicism in particular. There are quite a few passages in the Nicomachean Ethics in which Aristotle clearly claims that morally good actions are done for their own sake or because it is the morally right thing to do:

Now excellent actions are noble and done for the sake of the noble. (EN IV, 2, 1120a23–24)

Now the brave man is as dauntless as man may be. Therefore, while he will fear even the things that are not beyond human strength, he will fear them as he ought and as reason directs, and he will face them for the sake of what is noble; for this is the end of excellence. (EN III, 10 1115b10-13)

The standard of all things is the good and the good man; he is striving for the good with all his soul and does the good for the sake of the intellectual element in him. (EN IX, 4, 1166a10–20)

The good man acts for the sake of the noble. (EN IX, 8, 1168a33-35)

For the wicked man, what he does clashes with what he ought to do, but what the good man ought to do he does; for the intellect always chooses what is best for itself, and the good man obeys his intellect. (EN IX, 8, 1169a15–18)

If the virtuous person acts because she thinks that it is the right thing to do, because she acts for the sake of the noble without any inclination other than to do good for the sake of the noble, then she is comparable with the Kantian moral agent. For example, according to Aristotle the noble is “that which is both desirable for its own sake and also worthy of praise” (Rhetoric I, 9, 1366a33); and in 1366b38–67a5 he holds the view that nobility is exhibited in actions “that benefit others rather than the agent, and actions whose advantages will only appear after the agent’s death, since in these cases we can be sure the agent himself gets nothing out of it” (Korsgaard 1998: 217). Hence it follows, the virtuous person will not be able to act in a non-virtuous way because he or she acts from a strong inner moral obligation to act according to the morally right thing, since it is the very nature of the virtuous person to act virtuously. The Kantian agent, instead, sometimes acts according to the universal law and hence performs a morally right action, and on other occasions he or she fails to do so. This is because he or she has no stable and firm disposition to always act in accordance with the universal law. That is the very reason why the Aristotelian virtuous person can be seen as an agent who is not only acting from duty in the sense of doing the right thing because it is right, but also because the virtuous person constantly perceives and adheres to the moral duty, that is, to act virtuously.

5. Conclusion

The upshot is, however, that the vital question of how to live a good life cannot be separated from the essential question of how one should act. Conceptually and phenomenologically, both questions are intimately interwoven and a complete ethical theory will always be concerned with both issues, independently of whether the theory is of ancient or modern origin.

6. References and Further Reading

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  • Baron, M. 1995. Kantian Ethics Almost Without Apology. New York: Cornell University Press.
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Author Information

John-Stewart Gordon
Email: jgordon@uni-koeln.de
University of Cologne, Germany
Vytautas Magnus University Kaunas, Lithuania




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