Elizabeth Anscombe, or Miss Anscombe as she was known, was an important twentieth century philosopher and one of the most important women philosophers of all time. A committed Catholic, and translator of some of Ludwig Wittgenstein’s most important work, she was an influential and original thinker in the Catholic tradition and the Wittgensteinian manner. Although she worked in almost every area of philosophy, she is best known to philosophers today for her work on ethics and the philosophy of action. Outside of philosophy she is best known for her conservative views on sexual ethics, which have inspired a number of student organizations, calling themselves the Anscombe Society, promoting chastity and traditional marriage. She is also well known for her opposition to the use of atomic weapons at the end of World War II.
In ethics, her most important work is the paper “Modern Moral Philosophy.” Contemporary interest in virtue theory can be traced directly to this paper, which put forward three theses: that all the major British moral philosophers from Henry Sidgwick on were essentially the same (that is, consequentialists); that the concepts of moral obligation, the use of the word ought with a special moral sense, and related notions, are harmful and should be dropped; and that we should stop doing moral philosophy until we have an adequate philosophy of psychology.
Her work on action, found mostly in her short book Intention, was a step in the direction of such a philosophy.
Gertrude Elizabeth Margaret Ancombe was born on March 18, 1919, in Limerick, Ireland. Her parents, Allen Wells Anscombe and Gertrude Elizabeth Anscombe (née Thomas), were British but living in Ireland because her father was serving there as an officer in the British Army. When they returned to Britain he was a schoolteacher, teaching science at Dulwich College in London. Anscombe herself went to Sydenham High School, graduating in 1937. While there she became interested in Catholicism and converted while still a teenager.
She studied classics and philosophy at St. Hugh’s College, Oxford, graduating with a First Class Honors degree in 1941. Later that year she married the philosopher Peter Geach, whom she had met in her first year at Oxford after a mass at Blackfriars. They went on to have seven children.
After another year at St. Hugh’s as a research student she moved to Newnham College, Cambridge, where she had a Research Fellowship. At Cambridge she met Ludwig Wittgenstein and attended his lectures, continuing to do so even after she had moved back to Oxford, to take up a Research Fellowship at Somerville College in 1946. She later had a Teaching Fellowship there until 1970, when she became the Professor of Philosophy at Cambridge University. She remained there until she retired from teaching in 1986.
Wittgenstein died in 1951, having named Anscombe as one of three literary executors of his estate. Her English translation of his Philosophical Investigations was published in 1953.
In 1956, because of President Truman’s having authorized the bombings of Hiroshima and Nagasaki, she publicly, but unsuccessfully, opposed Oxford University’s granting him an honorary degree. This was the beginning of the most fruitful period of her career, perhaps because she was driven by a sense of outrage that a man who had deliberately authorized the bombing of non-combatants could be so honored. Her book-length study of the nature of intentional action was published the following year, followed by the critical “Modern Moral Philosophy” the year after that.
Her inaugural lecture at Cambridge University in 1971 on “Causality and Determination” is now also regarded as something of a classic, and refers back to some points made in Intention.
She died in Cambridge on January 5, 2001.
In a typically Wittgensteinian way, Anscombe argued that some metaphysical theses are the result of our being misled by grammar. Her work on the first person singular is a good example of this way of dealing with philosophical problems. In her essay “The First Person,” Anscombe argues that the word I is not typically used to refer to an object, and so it does not refer to a non-physical soul or mind, but neither does it refer to a physical body. The word I is not a name I call myself. It is not a name at all, even though it can appear to be one.
If there is some question about who broke a vase then it is possible to make a mistake about who it was, and to be mistaken even about oneself having done it. For instance, you might think that you nudged it, but come to realize (perhaps after watching a video recording) that, although you came close, it was actually someone else who knocked it over. When we refer to a person we can, then, misidentify the person in question. But if I think to myself “I wonder what’s happening?” then no such misidentification is possible. This cannot be because I refers to my body and my body is always easy for me to identify, because one can misidentify whose body it was that did this or that. Anscombe points out that one could be in state of sensory deprivation and so quite unaware of one’s body (not of the fact that one has a body, of course, but of the body itself—ex hypothesi one’s awareness of one’s body, in this case, is temporarily non-existent). If I refers to anything that cannot be misidentified, in such a way that no mistake or failure of reference is possible, then it seems that René Descartes was right and I can only refer to a non-physical thinking thing, the “thinking that thinks this thought” (Anscombe 1981b, p. 31), which might not be the same thinking as thought any previous thoughts. According to Anscombe this is an absurdity that shows that I cannot be a referring expression at all.
The reason why David Hume sought unsuccessfully for his self (finding instead only a bundle of impressions and ideas) is that there is indeed no self, no thing to which I refers, because I does not refer to anything (not even a bundle). This is why there can be no misidentification: there is no identification at all, so it cannot go wrong. In order to say whether I am standing or not, I do not need (in normal circumstances) to look. According to Anscombe this is because I does not refer to anything I might see (or sense in any other way). Knowledge of what one is doing, like knowledge of one’s opinions, is non-observational. If it referred to an object, therefore, the object in question would have to be one that could be identified without being observed by means of the senses. The only way to avoid Cartesian absurdity, therefore, as Anscombe sees it, is to deny that the first person singular refers to anything at all. It is a word with a use but no reference. Failure to appreciate this grammatical feature, she holds, is what leads into the metaphysical mire of Descartes, Hume, and others who have speculated about the identity of the self.
Like Wittgenstein, Anscombe was concerned about the culture around her. Her work on causation is an attack on a conception of causality that, she says, “helps to form a cast of mind which is characteristic of our whole culture,” (Anscombe, p. 133). In this essay she rejects the then (and perhaps still) dominant view, which comes from Hume, that the cause of some effect must either necessitate it or else be connected to it by some law. She does not deny that events are caused, but she does want to insist that it is usually possible for things to go awry. An arsonist might use enough gasoline to burn down a house without the house’s burning down being necessitated by this act. Something might happen to spoil his plans. And what this something might be cannot be specified in advance or in general, because it might be all kinds of things. This means that any causal law linking a cause C with an effect E will have to be of the form: If C then E, other things being equal. Very often other things are not equal, which is why the movement of the planets is relatively easy to predict but the movements of animals, for instance, are impossible to predict. It is impossible in practice because we never have enough information about the animal’s environment (a squirrel might run by, throwing the animal off its course), brain chemistry (we simply do not know exactly how brains work yet), and so on, but it might also be impossible even in theory, given the effects of events at the quantum level. These can, after all, spill over into the level of visible objects, since, to give one of Anscombe’s own examples, a Geiger counter could be connected to a bomb so that the bomb went off at some impossible-to-determine time, depending on ionizing radiation. The explosion would then be caused but not in a way that could, even in principle, be predicted.
Similarly, Anscombe argues, if I contract a disease after having been exposed to it, then it is easy to see what caused my getting sick. But if all I knew was that I had been exposed to the disease then quite possibly no one would be able to tell whether I would become sick. It is much easier to trace an effect back to its cause than it is to read off the supposedly inevitable effects of any potential cause. We can therefore know that one thing caused another without knowing any true law involving a necessary connection between events of one general type and events of another.
It is sometimes said that one cannot observe causation, because we observe events but not the necessity with which we believe them to be connected. Anscombe objects that we do observe drinking, vocalizing, cutting, and breaking, and that these all appear to be kinds of causation. If a cat drinks some milk then the cat’s action caused the milk to leave the saucer. If a tailor cuts some cloth then it seems entirely possible to see the causing of the cloth’s being divided. Anyone who denies this, Anscombe suggests, does so on the basis of a prejudice or philosophical theory about observation and causality. They do not, as they might think, believe in the theory because unbiased reflection on experience tells us that this kind of theory is true.
If every bit of human behavior were determined by causal laws, then it might seem that the difference between intended and unintended results of action could not possibly matter. For if determinism is true, some people think, then we are not free to act one way or another and assigning responsibility for actions makes no sense. In that case, it looks as though only consequences could matter. Anscombe rejects both determinism and consequentialism. Her book Intention aims to shed light on the concept of intention, and hence on (intentional) action, and the difference between intentional, rational action and non-rational behavior. Although not easy to understand, it has been enormously influential. Donald Davidson, for instance, has called it the most important philosophical work on action since Aristotle.
All manner of movements occur in the world, but only some are counted as the behavior of agents. In turn, only some of this behavior is counted as action. For instance, I might toss and turn in my sleep, and this would normally be reckoned as human behavior, but no one would think to ask me why I rolled over at some particular time or twitched my leg just so. In a sense these are not things that I did. My leg twitched, my body moved, but I really had no say in the matter and so would have no answer to a question about my reason for moving in these ways. I might be able to explain the cause, but I would be in no better a position than anyone else to do so, unless I happen to be some sort of expert on human physiology. Action is not like this: it does make sense to ask someone why they did what they did. In asking such a question we are typically asking about their intention, that is, what did they take themselves to be doing and what was their purpose in doing it. In a sense, then, questions about intention are questions about the meaning of actions. This sets them apart from questions about causes, since I might not know what caused me to sleep so restlessly but I cannot be so ignorant of my intentions. I could hypothesize that dehydration caused me to sleep badly, but if I get up to drink some water then it is no hypothesis on my part that I am heading to the kitchen to get something to drink. Nor is it a prediction about what I expect to happen once I reach the kitchen. It is a statement of fact about what I am doing right now: going to the kitchen to drink some water. Other descriptions of my behavior might be equally true. For instance, that I am putting one foot in front of the other, making the floorboards creak, and so on. But the statement of my intention, of what I take myself to be doing, is likely to be the most illuminating for anyone who wants to understand what I am doing (which is closely related to the question of why I am doing it). If I am failing to achieve my goal it might be even more helpful to know what that goal was, since it will not be so clearly visible as it is in the cases in which I do achieve it.
The “class of intentional actions is a sub-class,” according to Anscombe, of “the class of things known without observation,” (Anscombe 2000, p. 14). Intentional actions are ones done for some reason, actions about which it makes sense to ask “Why?” and expect an answer that is not merely causal but explains what significance the action was taken to have for the agent. The intention is not itself a cause because causes (for example, a brick’s striking a window) are distinct from their effects (for example, the window’s breaking), whereas intentional actions are not distinct from the intentions they embody. To see this point more clearly, imagine a climber who loses the will to live and so lets go of the rock and falls to his death. This was intentional, an act of suicide. Now imagine that he simply loses his grip and falls. This is unintentional and not suicide but a tragic accident. Now imagine that he has a momentary suicidal impulse. Shocked by this thought he loses concentration and lets go, falling to his death. This fall was caused by a thought of suicide, perhaps even by an intention to commit suicide, but it was an accident still, caused by a shock rather than carried out deliberately. So intentional actions are not behavior caused by intentions. The intention is a part or an aspect of the act, not a prior event that causes it.
An accidental fall will not be judged morally by anyone, but some people regard suicide as a sin. Similarly, in general, we tend to think of unintentional behavior as largely irrelevant to ethics, while intentional actions are precisely what ethics is often taken to be about. This is one reason why it matters what intention is and how intentional actions are understood. Another is that, since intentional actions are so closely linked to the question “Why?”, understanding intention helps us to understand what goes on around us. Generally people act for reasons, and these reasons have to do with what seems good to the agents in question. Not everything that seems good really is good, of course, but not just anything can even seem good. If someone’s reason for acting is to get all his green books up on a roof then, in knowing this reason, we gain no understanding of why he is behaving as he does. His behavior is as unintelligible as it would have been if we had not been told his reason. So the behavior of our fellow human beings is only intelligible if we can and do relate it to a certain limited range of ideas about what might be regarded as good. We can see here some of the connection that Anscombe believes to exist between metaphysical questions and ethical ones.
Perhaps this explains why intentions matter, but what are intentions? We might think of them as mental objects, states, or events that give rise to certain types of behavior, but Anscombe rejects this view. If an intention were a mental object or event that caused actions in roughly the way that a falling domino causes another domino to fall then it would appear to be quite possible to be ignorant of one’s own intentions. I might try to guess at or hypothesize about the intention that caused me to do this or that, but perhaps only some kind of brain scan would ever settle the matter. And perhaps we are wrong sometimes about our intentions, especially if we forget or have subconscious motivations. Nevertheless it seems implausible to suggest that we do not normally know exactly what our intentions are. We intend to go to the grocery store and, sure enough, that is precisely what we do.
Another problem with the idea that intentions are causes is that there seems to be no reason in theory why what acts as a cause in one person could not do so in another, but this does not appear to be the case with intentions. One cannot intend to do something of which one has no conception, but one could (at least in principle) be caused to do such a thing. An infant cannot intend to open the New York Stock Exchange but, if the opening is done by ringing a bell, then it can be caused to do it, either by moving the baby’s hand or by some chain of events within its brain. It might just on its own intend to ring the bell, but it would not be intending to open the day’s financial dealings. It has no idea that there are such things as financial dealings.
If we want to understand other people’s behavior, then, not only can we not look at the causes of their behavior (since, for one thing, we cannot see inside their brains) but trying to do so would be a mistake. We need to know what they take themselves to be doing, how they understand their actions. And this knowledge does not come from observation of their own behavior. We know without looking what it is that we take ourselves to be doing, what we are trying to achieve, and so on. In this sense we know what we are doing even if in fact something is going wrong and we are not getting done what we mean to be getting done. For instance, someone might intend to write Anscombe’s name on a chalkboard. Imagine that, unbeknownst to her, the board has recently been washed and no chalk will adhere to it. Without looking at what she is writing, she goes ahead and writes “Anscombe” on the board. Or so she thinks. In fact, nothing is being written. In a sense, then, she is not writing at all and if she thinks she is then she is wrong. On the other hand, she is doing something. And the best way to understand what this is would be to ask her and have her answer sincerely, “I am writing Anscombe on the board.” We would then understand why she is holding a piece of chalk and moving her hand in just that way. (If she were to say that she was trying to write Anscombe on the board this might be more accurate, but it would also be misleading. It would suggest that she knew the task would not be easy and was perhaps pushing the chalk harder than normal in order to try to get the chalk to stick to it. But she is not trying in this sense, any more than we ordinarily try to do the things we do. We just do them.) In this sense, then, we know what we are doing because we know our intentions, and we do not have to look and see what we are doing to have this knowledge.
It is possible to act badly because of having a bad intention, of course, but it is also possible, as the example of writing on a wet chalkboard shows, for action to go wrong because of errors in execution. This is part of the point of Anscombe’s famous shopping list example (see Anscombe 2000, p. 56). A shopping list acts as a kind of expression of what I intend to buy, or of what someone else has asked me to buy. The only kind of mistake I can make in using it (assuming that the list itself is correct) is if I overlook or misread something on the list and thus fail to buy it. This is a mistake in execution. If there is a mismatch between what I buy and what is on the list, in other words, then I have done my shopping badly. It is not that there is some flaw in the list. On the other hand, if someone else follows me and writes down everything I buy, but his list does not match what I buy, then there is a flaw in his list. So his list can be wrong in a way that mine cannot be. If now instead of a list written on paper we think of a list in my head, then we can see that my knowledge of what I am to buy cannot be falsified by how the facts turn out (for example, that I forget to buy tomatoes). That was a mistake in execution, not in intention. Unlike the man following me, I know what I intend to do, know what I am doing, without having to observe my behavior.
Because, as she sees it, actions can be bad and can be known to be bad without observing them or their results, Anscombe rejects a large class of theories about ethics. One of her main contributions to ethics is the introduction of the word consequentialism as a label for these theories, along with an account of their alleged shortcomings. Consequentialism is the denial that there is any significant moral difference between results of action that are brought about intentionally and those that are foreseen but not intended. It might be thought of as the theory that intention is unimportant in ethics. Anscombe seems to have opposed this kind of theory for several reasons, which we will explore below. The word consequentialism is often used as a kind of technical synonym for utilitarianism, but it was coined by Anscombe (in “Modern Moral Philosophy”) precisely to distinguish a certain kind of moral theory from utilitarianism. She apparently believed that neither Jeremy Bentham nor John Stuart Mill had a coherent moral philosophy, since each relied heavily on what she regarded as a hopelessly simplistic notion of happiness or pleasure.
Her main objection to consequentialism is a moral one. If all that matters is results, then there is no limit to what we might do in order to achieve the best results possible. In order to save the lives of many of our soldiers we might, for instance, murder a bunch of children. This is basically what she believed had been done in Hiroshima and Nagasaki, and it is unthinkable from her moral perspective. Indeed, it would have been unthinkable from the point of view of all major moral philosophers, including utilitarian ones, before Sidgwick. At least so she believes. Why she thinks this is not entirely clear, but Mill has certainly appeared to be a rule-utilitarian to some people, and rule-utilitarians typically defend rules forbidding murder. Perhaps Anscombe read Mill in this kind of way (she does not say). Another possibility is that she regards consequentialism as so unacceptable that it would be uncharitable to read anyone as holding it if their views are at all ambiguous. Mill’s views are certainly open to a variety of interpretations. What is clear is that Anscombe regarded the utilitarianism of Bentham and Mill as fatally flawed because it advocates the greatest happiness of the greatest number without (in her view) adequately specifying what is meant by happiness and without realizing (in her view) that “the greatest happiness of the greatest number” makes no sense (see Anscombe 1981a, p. 129). She does not fully explain why she thinks this to be the case, but people have wondered whether the concern is, or should be, with the best happiness or the most, and of living people or all living sentient creatures or all future sentient creatures or what, and how one might measure happiness at all. So she might have thought that utilitarianism simply does not name an identifiable theory at all.
Another problem with consequentialism is its ignoring of intention, without which we seemingly cannot make sense of human behavior. This means that, while we can indeed pass judgment on actions in a consequentialist way, we cannot consistently live as if consequentialism were true. We cannot, that is, live our whole lives as if intentions do not matter, even though we can pretend that they do not when deciding what to do or expressing approval or disapproval of actions. Consequentialists then are almost inevitably in bad faith. They pretend to believe what they cannot and do not in fact believe.
Before “Modern Moral Philosophy” was published, the main kind of ethical theory other than utilitarianism to which philosophers adhered was Kantian deontology, which, in its purest form, says that certain acts are forbidden or permissible, regardless of their consequences. Anscombe questions who or what might be supposed to do the forbidding or permitting in question. Traditionally (as she sees it) the answer was God. But many philosophers, even religious ones, do not want to import faith in God into their theories. So what could be meant by a theory, conceived as independent of faith in God, according to which some acts are allowed or right or even obligatory while others are forbidden or wrong? One cannot meaningfully obligate oneself, Anscombe believes, and the idea that something like society or the government is doing the allowing here is not what is wanted by people who theorize in this way. Anscombe’s conclusion is that talk of moral obligation, moral duty, a special moral sense of the word ought, and so on, are in fact meaningless.
This is not to say that all talk of obligation and the rest should be dropped. Indeed, Anscombe writes that we ought not to try to drop such talk. By this, of course, she means that it would be a bad idea to try to do so. But by bad here she means that it would not be prudent or sensible. She does not mean bad in some allegedly special or uniquely moral sense.
It is sometimes thought that Anscombe is saying that only religious believers are entitled to talk or think about moral obligation or what one morally ought to do. This is not the case. Her claim is rather that philosophers often use words such as morally ought in a way that makes no sense. She is not forbidding anything. She quite explicitly is not forbidding the use of the word ought. Nor would she forbid the use of the words morally ought in some situations. For instance, if a vegetarian tells you that you ought not to eat an underdone piece of chicken it might be unclear whether she is speaking about ethics or about food safety, and you might quite reasonably (in Anscombe’s view) ask whether she means ought in a moral sense or just the normal, prudential sense.
What Anscombe objects to is a secular use of religious concepts (not mere words). There is a religious tradition according to which certain kinds of action are commanded and others are forbidden by God. Within this tradition, the human race has an historical relationship with God, in which various promises have been made, covenants agreed to, and so on. It makes sense, therefore, to talk within this tradition of being bound or obliged to do this or that. It makes no sense, however, to think that one is equally bound in just the same way if this tradition is rejected or bracketed, set aside, for philosophical purposes. It is at best misleading, therefore, if anyone means to do philosophy in a religiously non-committal way but still asks what acts are forbidden, sinful, permissible, and so on. One problem with such language is that it seems to imply the very religious framework that is explicitly disavowed by the philosophers in question who use it.
Another is that it is so imprecise. For instance, if an atheist philosopher argues that abortion is permissible not only are we likely to be thrown by her religious-sounding choice of words, but we also do not know whether by permissible she means just, or likely to promote utility, or rational, or what. Anscombe’s argument is that such philosophers ought instead to use words such as just. This way we will have a much better idea what is being said. Judith Jarvis Thomson’s famous defense of abortion, for example, makes clear that she is talking about the justice of abortion, whether it violates the rights of the fetus, not whether it is callous or indecent, say. This is the kind of clarification that Anscombe recommends.
Sometimes, she adds, it will be immediately clear whether what is being said is true or false if we use more precise terms of moral evaluation such as just and unjust. Whether abortion is just is not immediately clear to many people, but the injustice of the judicial execution of those known to be innocent is clear. This is the example that Anscombe uses most often. The suggestion that deliberately killing tens of thousands of innocent non-combatants, including children, would be permissible is a vague one. The suggestion that it would be just is clearly false. The suggestion that it would be useful might be clearly true. If we used the more precise terms just and useful then we could at least see that the debate was between the relative importance of justice and utility. If we insist on using words such as permissible and wrong then we might fail to understand what is at issue. It is largely clarity that Anscombe urges philosophers to strive for.
Her rejection of both consequentialism and obligation-centered deontological ethical theories has been a major reason for the rise of virtue ethics. That being said, it is worth repeating that Anscombe does not reject all talk of moral obligation. For instance, if I make a promise or sign a contract then this brings certain obligations with it. In the case of promising, we might call this a moral obligation, to distinguish it from the kind of legal obligation that a contract might create. This kind of obligation is not absolute in the way that some people think the obligation not to commit murder is, however. Only the person who happens to have made a promise is obligated by it, for one thing. For another, promises can reasonably be ignored in exceptional circumstances. Thirdly, promising itself is a useful but not necessarily essential human practice. It is, Anscombe thinks, only against the background, or within the context, of this kind of practice that saying “I promise to do x” binds the speaker to do x. (In contrast, she regards murder as forbidden to all people in all circumstances.)
This relates to the easily misunderstood notion of what Anscombe calls brute facts. In her essay “On Brute Facts” she writes: “In relation to many descriptions of events or states of affairs which are asserted to hold, we can ask what the ‘brute facts’ were; and this will mean the facts which held, and in virtue of which, in a proper context, such-and-such a description is true or false, and which are more ‘brute’ than the alleged facts answering to that description” (Anscombe 1981a, p. 24). Take the state of affairs that, I assert, you owe me money. The brute facts in such a case would be the ones that make it true (if it is true) that you owe me money. For instance, my having given you money last week and your having promised to pay me back would be brute facts in this case. Anscombe is explicit that the context is relevant and that exceptional circumstances can always make a difference. It looks straightforward that if I loaned you money and you promised to pay it back then you owe me money, but you might not owe me anything if we were both clearly joking when the loan was made, or if I have died and left no family behind, or if the planet is about the be destroyed by meteors, or ….
So brute facts are, by definition, always brute relative to some description of an event or state of affairs. Brute here does not mean absolute as opposed to relative. Furthermore, while brute facts make descriptions true, they do so only other things being equal. Other things can fail to be equal in innumerable, unforeseeable ways, and so obligations of this kind can never be said to be absolute in the sense of being without exception. Nevertheless, in normal circumstances, if you have promised to do something then you really are obliged to do it, just as in chess bishops really do have to move diagonally (if at all) and, in the United States, cars really do have to drive on the right hand side of the road. These obligations are real and important even though the rules might be different (for example, in Great Britain cars drive on the left) and even though, in certain circumstances, they might be ignored (for example, you are rushing to a hospital and no other vehicles are on the road so no one cares what side you drive on, or the world is coming to an end so no one cares about anything much at all). Certain practices have rules and these rules oblige us to behave in certain ways, but a) exceptions can be made within the practices themselves, and b) there is no obligation (although there may be good reason) to engage in these practices in the first place. In this sense the obligation to keep a promise is not an absolute obligation.
This is not to say, however, that there are no absolutes in ethics. Certainly Anscombe believes that murder is never justified. If there is an obligation not to commit murder then it does not stem from our having chosen to engage in some human practice that forbids it. Anscombe might say that we must not murder because God has forbidden it. Or she might regard it as ruled out by considerations of justice. Or by a mystical perception of the value of human life. In “Murder and the Morality of Euthanasia” she writes that, “The prohibition [on murder] is so basic that it is difficult to answer the question as to why murder is intrinsically wrongful” (Anscombe 2005, p. 266). Her use of the word prohibition, however, suggests that she is thinking of murder as something forbidden by God. Given her thoughts on the notion of moral obligation, after all, we might surely ask who else might prohibit it? Whether this speculation about her meaning is right or not, she clearly does regard the intentional killing of the innocent as prohibited, and this is hugely relevant to her thinking about both the ethics of warfare and sexual ethics.
Anscombe’s first philosophical publication was a pamphlet of which she was joint author (with Norman Daniel) protesting at the prospect of the Second World War in 1939. In her view this war was likely to be fought for unjust reasons and with unjust means. According to her interpretation of the rules and of the statements of the relevant politicians, traditional rules of war would be broken by the British Government if it went to war with Germany. This was not, of course, a reflection of Anscombe’s attitude toward Nazi Germany. Some war against that country might have been justified, but not the war that she saw coming, with, for instance, its attacks on civilians.
She continued her support for traditional Christian thinking about military ethics after the war was over. Most notably, she led the protest against Oxford University’s decision to award an honorary degree to the man who ordered the use of atomic weapons against Japan, President Harry S. Truman. In her essay on “War and Murder,” she defends the so-called Doctrine of Double Effect and rejects pacifism. Despite having such high standards that she opposed even the British fight against the Nazis, Anscombe stops short of all out pacifism because she thinks that one’s moral standards should be high but not too high. Pacifism calls for no use of violence ever, no matter what, which is an ideal that many people can claim to respect but that very few can live with. The result, as she sees it, is that they pay lip service to the ideal of pacifism, go to war anyway, and then see no reason to observe any restrictions whatever on how the war is fought. In this way pacifism actually does harm.
The Doctrine of Double Effect points out that actions can be regarded as having two kinds of foreseen effects: the intended and the not intended (merely foreseen). It allows actions that have bad foreseen effects so long as these are not intended, so long as the actions themselves are not forbidden, and so long as the likely good consequences of the action outweigh its likely bad consequences. In any war we can foresee that innocent people will be killed in cases of friendly fire and collateral damage, for example. And killing the innocent is often regarded as forbidden. It does not follow, Anscombe argues, that we must be pacifists. Causing some collateral damage does not make one a murderer as long as one is engaged in a just war, fighting justly, (intentionally) targeting only legitimate military targets, and not launching attacks whose effects are likely to be more bad than good.
Critics of the doctrine sometimes object that one can make an otherwise forbidden act all right by simply redescribing it in one’s mind. For instance, one might claim to be intending to lower enemy morale by destroying a city and merely to foresee that innocent people in the city would be killed. One thing that this ignores, however, is that an intention is not a mental act, like a kind of whispering under one’s breath. In normal circumstances, one does what one intends, so the intention is observable in the physical world. Referees can call intentional fouls without having to be mind-readers. Saying “oops” or “I think I’ll just stretch my leg” in one’s head as one trips an opponent does not make the foul less intentional. So this criticism seems to be misguided. (It is true, though, Anscombe notes, that some people do try to abuse the doctrine by treating intention in this misguided kind of way.)
Perhaps more serious is Jonathan Glover’s objection that blowing up a passenger ferry bound for Nazi-occupied territory with both innocent people and the means for making an atomic bomb on it would have to count as intentional murder, and therefore forbidden, even though the consequences of allowing the ferry to reach its destination might be disastrous (see his Humanity: A Moral History of the Twentieth Century, Yale University Press, 2001, p. 108). The temptation to think like a consequentialist in such cases is rather strong. Anscombe might reply, however, that the actual goal in this case is preventing the Nazis from acquiring atomic weapons. So the deaths of the passengers, though certainly foreseen, are really not what is intended. Hence the sinking of the ferry might well turn out to be permissible after all. Unlike the case of terror bombing, where the desired terror would not have been created without innocent deaths, the ferry could have been sunk without the loss of innocent life (if no one had been on it).
Anscombe was a devout Catholic. She opposed abortion, contraception, gay sex, and gay marriage. Her view of abortion was not that it was murder but that it was either murder or something very nearly as bad as murder. (Whether it actually is murder depends on whether a fetus is a person or has a soul and, if so, at what stage, which Anscombe regarded as a technical question of little but academic interest.) It is, she believed, the deliberate destruction of the beginning of a human life. Sex, the means of this beginning, is something that she regarded as naturally associated with shame. Not in the sense that people who have sex ought to be ashamed of themselves or feel guilty, but in the sense that it is the kind of thing that belongs to one’s private life. We would no more have sex casually than we would leave home naked casually. This is because we recognize, however dimly, that sex is, to put it bluntly, a big deal. And this is connected with the fact that sex is how babies are made, and the fact that the life of a baby is a big deal. These connections should not be taken as steps in a logical argument, however, as if we can know by reasoning straightforwardly from the value of human life that casual sex is wrong. In her essay “Contraception and Chastity,” Anscombe says that our knowledge that casual sex dishonors the body is a “mystical perception,” much like the perception that a dead human body is not something one should leave out with the trash (Anscombe 2008, p. 187). She says in this essay also that there is no such thing as casual sex and that everyone knows this. That is, there are no sexual acts that are not significant, and those who pretend otherwise become shallow. She does not claim to be able to prove this though.
Contraception is not quite the same as abortion, but it is bad in a related way, she thinks. She distinguishes between two kinds of sexual intercourse: the kind that is intended to be non-procreative and the kind that is not so intended. Any sexual act that never could lead to procreation, such as masturbation, is in the former category, and so is sex using contraception. Sexual acts that could lead to procreation but that will not because at least one partner is naturally infertile fall in the latter category. Acts of the first type are abuses of our generative organs, treating as mere vehicles of pleasure the very means to bring new life into the world. Acts of the second type, on the other hand, are perfectly all right, so long as one does not make a point of only having sex when one knows that pregnancy is impossible, one does not get too addicted to sexual pleasure, and one has sex only within marriage as traditionally defined, so that any children will likely have a father and a mother to take care of them.
In her opinion, gay sex is wrong then in exactly the same way, and for the same reason, that masturbation is wrong. It is a use of the sexual organs that can never lead to procreation, and thus a kind of insult to life itself. Gay marriage is a union founded on an agreement to engage in this kind of activity, and is hence unacceptable.
Anscombe suggests that masturbators and gay people are bound to be unhappy, and critics have responded with examples of gay people who seem, on the contrary, to have flourished. This might be a point worth making, but it misses the central claim in her argument. This is that unnatural kinds of sex, those that embody an intention to have sex without the possibility of conception, fail to show the proper regard for life. The real problem this argument faces, whether one supports it or not, is the seemingly inescapable vagueness of the notion of proper regard. This vagueness exists within Anscombe’s beliefs about how much sex married couples should have. They should, she thinks, have some, but not too much. And she struggles to specify how much is too much. They should not be addicted to sex, she apparently thinks, but should “render the marriage debt” to one another (Anscombe 1981a, p. 92). One need not doubt that there is such a thing as proper respect for life, or for sex, in order to doubt how precisely one can make out what exactly falls within the limits of such regard and what does not.
As for gay marriage, similarly, Anscombe argues that only if a marriage is of the kind that could lead to children being brought into the world (that is, if it is a heterosexual marriage, even if one or both partners is known to be infertile) is its beginning an event worthy of ceremony. And, she implies, if its beginning is not an event worthy of ceremony then it is not a proper marriage. It is hard to see exactly how this kind of view can avoid regarding infertile marriages as somehow belonging to a second class. It is also hard to see how one could ever work out exactly which events are worthy of ceremony (and how much, and of what kind) in the first place. Some critics have argued that if Anscombe is right then this or that bad consequence would follow. The problem appears to be more that nothing at all follows with any clarity from her premises, whether one accepts them or not. This is not to say that Anscombe is wrong to believe that ceremony is in order at a wedding. What it is to say is that the perception that ceremony is in order is not the kind of perception that is readily testable or precisely measurable. In a word it is subjective or, as Anscombe sometimes puts it, mystical. When mystical perception is not universal it is hard to use it as the basis for arguments over controversial subjects.
Anscombe’s translations of, and commentaries on, works by Wittgenstein are certainly important, but will not be listed here. The same goes for her other work in the history of philosophy. The following bibliography is not intended to be comprehensive but rather is meant as an introductory guide.
Some of Anscombe’s work, especially the essays dealing with sexual and military ethics, was written for a general audience. The rest of it, however, can be very hard going, even for professional philosophers. Useful secondary sources include:
Virginia Military Institute
U. S. A.
Last updated: March 27, 2012 | Originally published: