Saint Anselm was one of the most important Christian thinkers of the eleventh century. He is most famous in philosophy for having discovered and articulated the so-called “ontological argument;” and in theology for his doctrine of the atonement. However, his work extends to many other important philosophical and theological matters, among which are: understanding the aspects and the unity of the divine nature; the extent of our possible knowledge and understanding of the divine nature; the complex nature of the will and its involvement in free choice; the interworkings of human willing and action and divine grace; the natures of truth and justice; the natures and origins of virtues and vices; the nature of evil as negation or privation; and the condition and implications of original sin.
In the course of his work and thought, unlike most of his contemporaries, Anselm deployed argumentation that was in most respects only indirectly dependent on Sacred Scripture, Christian doctrine, and tradition. Anselm also developed sophisticated analyses of the language used in discussion and investigation of philosophical and theological issues, highlighting the importance of focusing on the meaning of the terms used rather than allowing oneself to be misled by the verbal forms, and examining the adequacy of the language to the objects of investigation, particularly to the divine nature. In addition, in his work he both discussed and exemplified the resolution of apparent contradictions or paradoxes by making appropriate distinctions. For these reasons, one title traditionally accorded him is the Scholastic Doctor, since his approach to philosophical and theological matters both represents and contributed to early medieval Christian Scholasticism.
Anselm was born in 1033 in Aosta, a border town of the kingdom of Burgundy. In his adolescence, he decided that there was no better life than the monastic one. He sought to become a monk, but was refused by the abbot of the local monastery. Leaving his birthplace as a young man, he headed north across the Alps to France, eventually arriving at Bec in Normandy, where he studied under the eminent theologian and dialectician Lanfranc, whose involvement in disputes with Berengar spurred a revival in theological speculation and application of dialectic in theological argument. At the monastery of Bec, Anselm devoted himself to scholarship, and found an earlier childhood attraction to the monastic life reawakening. Unable to decide between becoming a monk at Bec or Cluny, becoming a hermit, or living off his inheritance and giving alms to the poor, he put the decision in the hands of Lanfranc and Maurilius, the Archbishop of Rouen, who decided Anselm should enter monastic life at Bec, which he did in 1060.
In 1063, after Lanfranc left Bec for Caen, Anselm was chosen to be prior. Among the various tasks Anselm took on as prior was that of instructing the monks, but he also had time left for carrying on rigorous spiritual exercises, which would play a great role in his philosophical and theological development. As his biographer, Eadmer, writes: “being continually given up to God and to spiritual exercises, he attained such a height of divine speculation that he was able by God’s help to see into and unravel many most obscure and previously insoluble questions…” (1962, p. 12). He became particularly well known, both in the monastic community and in the wider community, not only for the range and depth of his insight into human nature, the virtues and vices, and the practice of moral and religious life, but also for the intensity of his devotions and asceticism.
In 1070, Anselm began to write, particularly prayers and meditations, which he sent to monastic friends and to noblewomen for use in their own private devotions. He also engaged in a great deal of correspondence, leaving behind numerous letters. Eventually, his teaching and thinking culminated in a set of treatises and dialogues. In 1077, he produced the Monologion, and in 1078 the Proslogion. Eventually, Anselm was elected abbot of the monastery. At some time while still at Bec, Anselm wrote the De Veritate (On Truth), De Libertate Arbitrii (On Freedom of Choice), De Casu Diaboli (On the Fall of the Devil), and De Grammatico.
In 1092, Anselm traveled to England, where Lanfranc had previously been arch-bishop of Canterbury. The Episcopal seat had been kept vacant so King William Rufus could collect its income, and Anselm was proposed as the new bishop, a prospect neither the king nor Anselm desired. Eventually, the king fell ill, changed his mind in fear of his demise, and nominated Anselm to become bishop. Anselm attempted to argue his unfitness for the post, but eventually accepted. In addition to the typical cares of the office, his tenure as arch-bishop of Canterbury was marked by nearly uninterrupted conflict over numerous issues with King William Rufus, who attempted not only to appropriate church lands, offices, and incomes, but even to have Anselm deposed. Anselm had to go into exile and travel to Rome to plead the case of the English church to the Pope, who not only affirmed Anselm’s position, but refused Anselm’s own request to be relieved of his office. While archbishop in exile, however, Anselm did finish his Cur Deus Homo, also writing the treatises Epistolae de Incarnatione Verbi (On the Incarnation of the Word), De Conceptu Virginali et de Originali Peccato (On the Virgin Conception and on Original Sin), De Processione Spiritus Sancti (On the Proceeding of the Holy Spirit), and De Concordia Praescientia et Praedestinationis et Gratiae Dei cum Libero Arbitrio (On the Harmony of the Foreknowledge, the Predestination, and the Grace of God with Free Choice).
Upon returning to England after William Rufus’s death, conflict eventually ensued between the archbishop and the new king, Henry I, requiring Anselm once again to travel to Rome. When judgment was made by Pope Paschal II in Anselm’s favor, the king forbade him to return to England, but eventually reconciliation took place. Anselm died in 1109, leaving behind several pupils and friends of some importance, among them Eadmer, Anselm’s biographer, and the theologian Gilbert Crispin. He was declared a doctor of the Roman Catholic Church in 1720, and is considered a saint by the Roman Catholic Church and the churches in the Anglican Communion.
Today, Anselm is most well known for his Proslogion proof for the existence of God, but his thought was widely known in the Middle Ages, and still today in certain circles of scholarship, particularly among religious scholars, for considerably more than that single achievement. For fuller biographies of Anselm, see Eadmer’s Vita Sancti Anselmi/ The Life of St. Anselm: Archbishop of Canterbury, and Alexander’s Liber ex dictis beati Anselmi.
With the exception of St. Augustine, and to a lesser extent Boethius, it is difficult to definitively ascribe the influence of other thinkers to the development of St. Anselm’s thought. To be sure, Anselm studied under Lanfranc, but Lanfranc does not appear to have been a significant influence on the actual content or expression of Anselm’s thought, and he largely ignored Lanfranc’s misgivings about the method of theMonologion. Anselm cites Boethius, but does not draw upon him extensively. Other figures have been proposed as influences on Anselm, for instance John Scotus Eriugena and Pseudo-Dionysus, but any such proposals are set in the proper framework by these remarks from Koyré: “The influence of these two great thinkers is not at all lacking in verisimilitude a priori.” (Koyré 1923, 109). It is possible that either one of them, or other thinkers, influenced Anselm, but going beyond mere possibility given the texts we possess is controversial.
Discerning influences on Anselm’s work is for the most part conjectural, precisely because Anselm makes so few references to previous thinkers in his work. In the preface to the Monologion he writes: “Reexamining the work often myself, I have been able to find nothing that I have said in it, that would not agree [cohaereat] with the writings of the Catholic Fathers and especially with those of the blessed Augustine.” (S. v. 1, p.8)
[All citations of Anselm’s texts (except for the Fragments) are the author’s translations from S. Anselmi Cantuariensis Archepiscopi Opera Omnia, abbreviated here as S., followed by (when needed) the volume and the page numbers. Latin terms in brackets or parentheses have been romanized to current orthography. All citations of the Fragments are the author’s translations from the Ein neues unvollendetes Werk des heilige Anselm von Canterbury, henceforth abbreviated as u.W.]
Anselm references Augustine’s On the Holy Trinity, but as a whole work, giving no specific references. Clearly, Augustine was a major influence on Anselm’s thought, but that is in itself rather unremarkable, since practically all of his contemporaries fit in one way or another into the broad stream of the Augustinian tradition. As Southern summarizes the issues: “[T]he ambivalence of Anselm’s relations to St. Augustine remains one of the mysteries of his mind and personality. Augustine’s thought was the pervading atmosphere in which Anselm moved; but he was never content merely to reproduce Augustine.” (1963, 32)
In fact, one of the most important features of Anselm’s work is its originality. As Southern has also pointed out, this originality was not confined to the treatises and dialogues. In his more devotional prayers and meditations, Anselm adapted traditional forms to new content, (1963, 34-47) “open[ing] the way which led to the Dies Irae, the Imitatio Christi, and the masterpieces of later medieval piety.” (1963, 47) Although clearly indebted to an Augustinian (neo)-Platonic tradition often termed “Christian philosophy,” Anselm’s originality clearly furthered and expanded that tradition, and prepared the way for later Scholasticism. The term “Christian philosophy” was used in a variety of senses, particularly within and to denote the Augustinian tradition, and was applied to Anselm’s work by numerous interpreters. A set of debates, which gave rise to a sizable literature, and which are still to some extent being continued today, took place in Francophone circles (spreading to German, Italian, Spanish, and English-speaking circles in later years) in the early 1930s, about the nature and possibility of “Christian philosophy.” One of the main participants, Etienne Gilson, in fact used Anselm’s formula fides quaerens intellectum several times as one of the definitions of Christian philosophy.
Anselm’s work was influential for some of his contemporaries, and has continued to exercise influence in varying ways on philosophers and theologians to the present day. The so-called “ontological argument” has had numerous critics, defenders, and adaptors philosophically or theologically notable in their own right, among them St. Bonaventure, St. Thomas Aquinas, Descartes, Gassendi, Spinoza, Malebranche, Locke, Leibniz, Kant, Hegel, and an even greater number in the last century, not least of which were Charles Hartshorne, Etienne Gilson, Maurice Blondel, Martin Heidegger, Karl Barth, Norman Malcolm, and Alvin Plantinga. However, the “argument”(s) discussed in this literature are frequently not precisely what is found in Anselm’s texts, and a sizable literature has developed addressing that very issue.
Argument(s) for God’s being or existence form only a small portion of Anselm’s considerable and complex work, and his influence has been much wider and deeper than originating one perennial line of philosophical investigation and discussion. In his own time, he had several gifted students, among them Anselm of Laon, Gilbert Crispin, Eadmer (writer of the Vita Anselmi), Alexander (writer of the Dicta Anselmi), and Honorius Augustodunensis. His works were copied and disseminated in his lifetime, and exercised an influence on later Scholastics, among them Bonaventure, Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus, and William of Ockham. For further discussion of Anselm’s influence, cf. Châtillon, 1959, Southern, 1963, Rovighi, 1964, Hopkins, 1972, and Fortin, 2001.
The extent to which Anselm’s work, and which portions of it, ought to be considered to be philosophy or theology (or “philosophical theology,” “Christian philosophy,” and so forth) is a long debated question. The answers (and their rationales) depend considerably on one’s conceptions of philosophy and theology and their distinction and interaction. These admittedly important issues are set aside here in order to focus on three key features of Anselm’s work: Anselm’s pedagogical motivation and his intended audience; the notion of faith seeking understanding (fides quaerens intellectum); and Anselm’s stylistics and dialectic.
Anselm provides a paradigmatic account of the pedagogical motive structuring his works in theMonologion’s Prologue.
Some of the brothers have often and earnestly entreated me to set down in writing for them some of the matters I have brought to light for them when we spoke together in our accustomed discourses, about how the divine essence ought to be meditated upon and certain other things pertaining to that sort of meditation, as a kind of model for meditation.... They prescribed this form for me: nothing whatsoever in these matters should be made convincing [persuaderetur] by the authority of Scripture, but whatsoever the conclusion [finis], through individual investigations, should assert...the necessity of reason would concisely prove [cogeret], and the clarity of truth would evidently show that this is the case. They also wished that I not disdain to meet and address [obviare] simpleminded and almost foolish objections that occurred to me. (S. v. 1, p.7)
The original audience for his writings was fellow Benedictine monks seeking a fuller understanding of the Christian faith and asking that Anselm provide an articulation of it in a form quite different than those typical and traditional of their time, namely, where such theological discussions were carried out primarily through citation and interpretation of Scripture and patristic authorities. Anselm expresses this pedagogical motive again in the Cur Deus Homo: “I have often and most earnestly been asked by many, in speech and in writing, to commit in writing to posterity [memoriae. . commendem] reasonable answers [rationes] I am accustomed to give to those asking about a certain question of our faith.” (S. v. 2, p.47)
The goal of Anselm’s treatises is not to provide a philosophical substitute for the Christian faith, nor to rationalize or systematize it solely in the light of natural reason. Rather, in the cases of the Monologionand Proslogion, he aims to treat meditatively, by reason’s resources, central aspects of the Christian faith, namely, as he puts it in the Proslogion’s Prologue: “that God truly is, and that he is the supreme good needing no other, and that he is what all things need so that they are and so that they are well, and whatever else we believe about the divine substance.” (S., v. 1, p. 93) In the other treatises (excepting theDe Grammatico, which he explicitly states to be for “beginners in dialectic,” and that it “pertains to a different subject matter than [Sacred Scripture],” S., v.1, p. 173), Anselm concerns himself with other important, and often interrelated, aspects of the Christian faith, developing the arguments through reasoning, rather than through explicit reliance on Scriptural or patristic authority in the course of argumentation. Over the course of his career, Anselm’s intended audience expands considerably, however, particularly as he became involved in controversy over the Trinity that culminated in hisEpistola de Incarnatione Verbi and Cur Deus Homo.
The Proslogion’s Prologue provides a somewhat different, but clearly related motive for its production. After the Monologion, Anselm writes: “considering that that work was constructed from an interlinking [concatenatione] of many arguments, I began to wonder if perhaps a single argument [unum argumentum] that needed nothing other than itself alone for proving itself.” (S., v. 1, p. 93) Once he had uncovered this unum argumentum (“single argument”) after great effort and difficulty, Anselm wrote about it and several other related topics, in the interest of sharing the joy it had brought him, or at least pleasing another who would read it (alicui legenti placiturum).
Precisely what this single argument consists of has been a subject of considerable scholarly debate. A fairly common but clearly incorrect interpretation of the “single argument” takes it as referring only to the proof for God’s existence or being in Chapter 2, or at most Chapters 2-4. At the other extreme, some commentators take the single argument to be the entirety of the Proslogion. A third, intermediary position argues that the unum argumentum is the entirety of the Proslogion, minus the last three chapters, for two reasons: 1) Anselm calls the last three chapters coniectationes; 2) Anselm says in the prooemium that he wrote the Proslogion about the argument itself (de hoc ipso) and about several other things (et de quibusdam aliis).
As Anselm explains to his interlocutor Boso, his writing the De Conceptu Virginali is motivated by a purpose similar to that of the Proslogion, reexamining and rearticulating topics previously addressed in other works.
For I am certain that when you read in the Cur Deus Homo. . . that, besides the one I set down there, another reason can be glimpsed [posse uideri], how God took on humanity without sin from the sinful mass of the human race, your most studious mind will be driven not a little to asking what this reason is. Accordingly, I feared that I would appear unjust to you if I conceal what I think on this [quod inde mihi videtur] from your enjoyment [dilectioni tuae]. (S., v. 2, p. 139)
The prologue to the three connected dialogues (De Veritate, De Libertate Arbitrii, De Casu Diaboli) does not indicate conclusively whether they were written to answer specific requests of the monks. Clearly, however, they treat matters of both theological and philosophical interest arising out of reflection and discussion on Christian faith, life, and thought.
Fides quaerens intellectum, “faith seeking understanding” was the Proslogion’s original title and is an apt designation for Anselm’s philosophical and theological projects as a whole. Anselm begins from, and never leaves the standpoint of a committed and practicing Catholic Christian, but this does not mean that his philosophical work is thereby vitiated as philosophy by operating on the basis of and within the confines of theological presuppositions. Rather, Anselm engages in philosophy, employing reasoning rather than appeal to Scriptural or patristic authority in order to establish the doctrines of the Christian faith (which, as a faithful and practicing believer, he takes as already established) in a different, but possible way, through the employment of reason. Faith seeking understanding goes beyond simply establishing faith’s doctrines, however, precisely because it seeks understanding, the rational intelligibility (as far as is possible) of the doctrines.
Anselm does cite Scripture at certain points in his work, as well as “what we believe” (quod credimus), but attention to his texts indicates that he does not rely on scriptural or doctrinal authority directly to resolve problems or to provide starting points for his reasoning. In some cases, he has the student or his own questioning voice (as in Proslogion, Chapter 8) bring up Scriptural passages of truths of Christian doctrine in order to raise problems that require a rational resolution. In other cases (as in De Concordia, Book 1 Chapter 5), he does use Scriptural passages as starting points for arguments, but for erroneous arguments that he then criticizes. In yet other cases, Anselm brings up Scripture precisely to explain how certain passages or expressions should be rightly understood (as in the De Casu Diaboli, explaining how God causing evil should be understood). Lastly, Anselm cites Scripture after the course of his argument in order to reconnect the rational argumentation with Christian revelation (as in Proslogion, Chapter 16, where Anselm’s previous reasoning culminates in God “inhabiting” an “inaccessible light”). For discussion of Anselm and Scripture, cf. Barth, 1960, Tonini, 1970, and Henry, 1962.
In his actual exercise of reason, Anselm displays both confidence in reason’s capacity for providing understanding to faith, and awareness of the limitations human reason’s exercise eventually runs into and becomes aware of. For instance, in Proslogion, Chapter 15, he concludes that God is not only that than which nothing greater can be thought, but something greater than can be thought. Another important aspect of Anselm’s fides quaerens intellectum is that, in the Monologion, reason is employed by one who “disputes and investigates with himself things he had not previously taken notice of [non animadvertisset],” (S., v. 1, p. 8) and in the Proslogion, one “striving to raise his mind to the contemplation of God, and seeking to understand what he believes.” (S., v. 1, p. 94)
Despite Anselm’s deliberate employment of reason as a means to the truth about both the natural and the supernatural order, his rationalism is a mitigated one. Monologion Chapter 1 exemplifies this. Anselm’s assessment is that one could persuade oneself of the truths argued for in the Monologion by the use of one’s reason, but Anselm hastens to add: “I wish it to be understood [accipi] that, even if a conclusion is reached [concludatur] seemingly as necessary [quasi necessarium] from reasons that seem good to me, it is not that it is entirely [omnino] necessary, but only that for the current time [interim] it be said to be able to appear necessary.” (S., v. 1, p.14)
Chapter 64 of the Monologion provides another important discussion of the use of reason and argument. Anselm distinguishes between being able to understand or explain that something is true or that something exists, and being able to understand or explain how something is true. Since the divine substance, the triune God is ultimately beyond the capacities of human understanding, reason, or more precisely the reasoning human subject, must recognize both the limits and the capacities of reason.
I think that for someone investigating an incomprehensible matter it ought to be sufficient, if by reasoning towards it, he arrives at knowing that it most certainly does exist, even if he is unable to go further by use of the intellect [penetrare. . . intellectu] into how it is this way. Nor for that reason should we withhold the certainty of faith from those things that are asserted through necessary proofs [probationibus], and that are inconsistent with no other reason, if because of the incomprehensibility of their natural sublimity they do not allow themselves [non patiuntur] to be explained. (S., v. 1, p. 75)
Anselm is not skeptically questioning or undermining the capacities of reason and argumentation. Not every possible object the intellect attempts to engage with presents such problems, but only God. Accordingly, although a completely full and exhaustively systematic account cannot be provided of the divine substance, this does not undermine the certainty of what reason has been able to determine.
Stylistically, Anselm’s treatises take two basic forms, dialogues and sustained meditations. The former represent pedagogical discussions between a fairly gifted and inquisitive pupil and a teacher. In the latter, Anselm provides, as noted earlier, models of meditation, but the model differs considerably from theMonologion to the Proslogion, for in the first treatise, Anselm aims to provide a model of a person meditating, or (using Aristotle’s conception) engaging in dialectic with himself, while in the second case, the person addresses himself to the very God that he is attempting to comprehend as best as human capacities allow.
In the dialogue Cur Deus Homo, a student, Boso, “my brother and most beloved son” (S., v. 2, p. 139) is called by name. In the majority of the dialogues, the student and teacher are not named; it is clear, however, that the teacher represents Anselm and presents Anselm’s doctrines. The De Conceptu Virginali and the De Concordia are not written in the same dialogue form as the other treatises, but they are dialogical in their narrative voice(s), since Anselm addresses himself to another person (in the De Conceptu Virginali to Boso), articulating possible problems and objections his reader might make in order to address them.
The dialogue form serves a pedagogical purpose and reflects the project of fides quaerens intellectum, exemplified well by this passage from the De Casu Diaboli: “[L]et it not weary you to briefly reply to my silly questioning [fatuae interrogationi], so that I might know how I should respond to someone asking me the very same thing. Indeed, it is not always easy to respond wisely [sapienter] to someone who is asking foolishly [insipienter].” (S., v. 1, p. 275)
Interestingly, it appears that a recurring problem for Anselm was his treatises being copied and circulated without his authorization and before their final and finished state. He asserts this to be the case with the three connected dialogues and the Cur Deus Homo.
The following sections provide discussions of, and excerpts from, many of Anselm’s key works. With the exception of the Proslogion, Monologion, and Cur Deus Homo, the works are examined in chronological order (as best as we know it). These three works are discussed first and in this order because the Proslogion has garnered the most attention from philosophers (more than the earlierMonologion, with which it shares similar aims and content) and the Cur Deus Homo likewise has garnered more attention from theologians than the earlier three dialogues “pertaining to study of Sacred Scripture” (S., v.1, p. 173) (the De Veritate, De Libertate Arbitrii, and De Casu Diaboli).
In the Proslogion, Anselm intended to replace the many interconnected arguments from his previous and much longer work, the Monologion, with a single argument. Since the unum argumentum is supposed to prove not only that God exists, but other matters about God as well, as noted above, there is some scholarly controversy as to exactly what the argument is in the Proslogion’s text. Clearly, the so-called “ontological argument” for God’s existence in Chapter 2 plays a central role. It must be pointed out that Anselm nowhere uses the term “ontological argument,” nor in fact do the critics or proponents of the argument until Kant’s time. It has unfortunately become so ingrained in our philosophical vocabulary, especially in Anglophone Anselm scholarship, however, that it would be pedantic to insist on not using it at all. An interesting and sizable recent literature has developed explicitly contesting the appellation “ontological” applied to Anselm’s Proslogion proof(s) of God’s being or existence, a partial bibliography of which is provided in McEvoy, 1994.
Noting that God is believed to be something than which nothing greater can be thought (quo maius cogitari non potest), Anselm asks whether such a thing exists, since the Fool of the Psalms has said in his heart that there is no God.
But certainly that very same Fool, when he hears this very expression I say [hoc ipsum quod dico]: “something than which nothing greater can be thought,” understands what he hears; and what he understands is in his understanding [in intellectu], even if he does not understand that thing to exist. For it is one thing to be in the understanding, and another to understand a thing to exist. . . . . Therefore even the fool is compelled to admit [convincitur] that there is in his understanding something than which nothing greater can be thought, since when he hears this he understands it, and whatever is understood is in the understanding. And certainly that than which a greater cannot be thought cannot exist in the understanding alone. For if it is in the intellect alone [in solo intellectu], it can be thought to also be in reality [in re], which is something greater. If, therefore, that than which a greater cannot be thought is in the intellect alone, that very thing than which a greater cannot be thought is that than which a greater can be thought. But surely that cannot be. Therefore, without a doubt, something than which a greater cannot be thought exists [exsistit] both in the understanding and in reality. (S., v. 1, p. 101-2)
In Chapter 3, Anselm continues the argumentation, providing what some commentators take to be a second ontological argument.
And, it so truly exists that it cannot be thought not to be. For, a thing, which cannot be thought not to be (which is greater than what cannot be thought not to be), can be thought to be. So, if that than which a greater cannot be thought can be thought not to be, that very thing than which a greater cannot be thought is not that than which a greater cannot be thought, which cannot be compatible [convenire, i.e. with the thing being such]. Therefore, there truly is something than which a greater cannot be thought, and it cannot be thought not to be. (S., p. 102-3)
Addressing himself to God, Anselm explains why God cannot be thought not to exist, indicating why God uniquely has this status. “[I]f some mind could think something better than you, the creature would ascend over the Creator, and would engage in judgment about the Creator, which is quite absurd. And anything else whatsoever other than yourself can be thought not to exist. For you alone are the most true of all things, and thus you have being to the greatest degree [maxime], for anything else is not so truly [as God], and for this reason has less of being.” (S., p. 103) This raises a puzzle, however. Why does the Fool not only doubt whether God exists, but assert that there is no God? One possible, but rather circular answer is provided at the end of Chapter 3. “Why else, except because he is stupid and a fool?” (S., p. 103) As Anselm knows, however, that does not really answer the question. Chapter 4 provides an answer. The Fool both does and does not think [cogitare] that God does not exist, since there are two senses of “think”:
A thing is thought of in one way when one thinks of the word [vox] signifying it, in another way when what the thing itself is is understood. Therefore, in the first way it can be thought that God does not exist, but in the second way not at all. Indeed no one who understands that which God is can think that God is not, even though he says these words in his heart, either without any signification or with some other signification not properly applying to God [aliqua extranea significatione]. (S., p. 103-104)
Proslogion Chapters 5-26 deal progressively with the divine attributes, 5-23 either continuing or building off of the argument, and 24-26 being connected conjectures about God’s goodness. In Chapter 5, Anselm deduces attributes of God from the same “than which nothing greater can be thought” he used in Chapters 2-4.
What then are you, Lord God, that than which nothing greater can be thought? But what are you if not that which is the greatest of all things, who alone exists through himself, who made everything else from nothing? For whatever is not this, is less than what can be thought. But this cannot be thought about you. For what good is lacking to the supreme good, through which every good thing is? And so, you are just, truthful, happy, and whatever it is better to be than not to be. (S., p. 104)
These attributes of God, what it is better to be than not to be, are filled out in Chapter 6 (percipient, omnipotent, merciful, impassible), Chapter 11 (living, wise, good, happy, eternal), and Chapter 18 (an unity).
In Chapter 18, Anselm argues from God’s superlative unity to the unity of his attributes. “[Y]ou are so much a kind of unity [unum quiddam] and identical to yourself, that you are dissimilar to yourself in no way; indeed, you are that very unity, divisible by no understanding. Therefore, life and wisdom and the other [attributes] are not parts of you but all of them are one, and each of them is entirely what you are, and what the other [attributes] are.” (S., p. 115)
In Chapter 23, he employs this notion of superlative unity to explain how God can be a Trinity, indicating that all of the persons of the Trinity share equally and completely in the divine attributes. In the divine unity, the second person of the Trinity, the Son, or the Word is coequal to the first person, “Truly, there cannot be anything other than what you are, or anything greater or lesser than you in the Word by which you speak yourself; for your Word is true [verum] in the same way that you are truthful [quomodo tu verax], and for that reason he is the very same truth as you, not other than you.” (S., p. 117) The same holds for the third person of the Trinity, which is “the one love, common to you and your Son, that is, the Holy Spirit who proceeds from both.” (S., p. 117) Accordingly, for each of the persons of the Trinity, “what any of them is individually is at the same time the entire Trinity, the Father and the Son and the Holy Spirit; for, any one of them individually is not something other than the supremely simple unity and the supremely one simplicity, which cannot be multiplied or be one thing different from another.” (S., p. 117)
There are five other main matters that Anselm addresses in the Proslogion, the first three of which are sets of problems stemming from seeming incompatibilities in the divine attributes. Anselm puts these questions in Chapter 6. “How can you be perceptive [es sensibilis] if you are not a body? How can you be omnipotent, if you cannot do everything? How can you be merciful and impassible at the same time?” (S., p. 104) Anselm deals with the first briefly in Chapter 6, proposing that perceiving is knowing (cognoscere) or aimed at knowing (ad cognoscendum), so that God is supremely perceptive without knowing things through the type of sensibility human beings and animals have.
The argumentation of Chapter 7 is particularly important. There are things that God cannot do, for instance lying, being corrupted, making what is true to be false or what has been done to not be done. It seems that a truly omnipotent being ought to be able to do these things. To be able to do such things, Anselm suggests, is not really to have a power (potentia), but really a kind of powerlessness (impotentia). “For one who can do these things, can do what is not advantageous to oneself and what one ought not do. The more a person can do these things, the more adversity and perversity can do against that person, and the less that person can do against these.” (S., p. 105) So, one who does these things does them through powerlessness, through having one’s agency subjected to that of something other, rather than through one’s power. This, as Anselm explains, relies on an inexact manner of speaking, where one expresses powerlessness or inability as a kind of power or ability
In Chapters 8-11, through a longer and more sustained argument, Anselm answers the third question explaining how God can be both merciful and just at the same time. The explanation rests on God’s mercy stemming from his goodness, which is not ultimately something different from God’s justice, and which can be reconciled with it. Anselm concludes in Chapter 12: “But certainly, whatever you are, you are not through another but through yourself. Accordingly, you are the very life by which you live, and the wisdom by which you are wise, and the goodness by which you are good to good people and bad people; and likewise with similar attributes.” (S., p. 110) For God to be merciful to, forgive, and therefore not render justice to all transgressors, or likewise for God to not extend mercy, forgive, and therefore render justice to all transgressors would be for God to be something lesser than He is. It is, in effect, greater to be able to be just and merciful at the same time, which is possible for God precisely because justice and goodness coincide only in God. At the same time, Anselm concedes that when it comes to understanding precisely why God mercifully forgives of justly rendered judgment in a particular case is beyond our human capacities. For further discussion of Chapters 8-11, cf. Bayart, 1937, Corbin, 1988, and Sadler, 2006.
The fourth main issue, discussed in Chapters 14-17, has to do with our limited knowledge of God, which stems both from human sinfulness and God’s dazzling splendor. Again, as in Chapter 4, one can say that something is and is not the case at the same time, because it is being said in different and distinguishable ways. “If [my soul] did not see you [God], then it did not see the light or the truth. But, is not the truth and the light what it saw and yet did it still not yet see you, since it saw you only in a certain way [aliquatenus] but did not see you exactly as you are [sicuti es]?” (S., p. 111)
The reason the human soul does not see God directly is twofold, stemming both from finite human nature and from infinite divine nature. “But certainly [the human mind] is darkened in itself, and it is dazzled [reverbetur] by you. It is obscured by its own shortness of view [sua brevitate], and it is overwhelmed by your immensity. Truly it is restricted [contrahitur] in by its own narrowness, and it is overcome [vincitur] by your grandeur.” (S., p. 112) For this reason, in Chapter 15, Anselm concludes that God is in fact “greater than can be thought” (maior quam cogitari potest).
Finally, in Chapters 18-21, Anselm discusses God’s eternity. Anselm first indicates that God’s eternity is such that God is entirely present whenever and wherever God is, which is to say everywhere and at all times. Then, in Chapter 19, he begins to articulate the implications of God’s eternity more fully, ultimately leading into a transformation of perspective. Just as it is not the case that there is eternity and God happens to be in and is therefore eternal, since the reality is that God is eternity itself, God is not in every time or place, but rather everything, all times and places, is in God, that is, in God’s eternity.
Gaunilo, a monk from the Abbey of Marmoutier, while noting the value of the remainder of theProslogion, attacked its argument for God’s existence on several counts. His arguments prefigure many arguments made by later philosophers against ontological arguments for God’s existence, and Anselm’s responses provide additional insight into the Proslogion argument. Gaunilo makes four main objections, and in each case, Gaunilo transposes Anselm’s “that than which nothing greater can be thought” into “that which is greater than everything else that can be thought.”
Gaunilo asserts that an additional argument is needed to move from this being having been thought to it being impossible for it not to be. “It needs to be proven to me by some other undoubtable argument that this being is of such a sort that as soon as it is thought its undoubtable existence is perceived with certainty by the understanding.” (S., v. 1, p. 126) He brings up this need for a further, unsupplied, argument twice more in his Reply, and in the last instance discusses what is really at issue. The Fool can say: “[W]hen did I say that in the truth of the matter [rei veritate] there was such a thing that is ‘greater than everything?’ For first, by some other completely certain argument, some superior nature must be proven to exist, that is, one greater or better than everything that exists, so that from this we could prove all the other things that cannot be lacking to what is greater or better than everything else.” (S., p. 129)
A second problem is whether one can actually understand what is supposed to be understood in order for the argument to work because God is unlike any creature, anything that we have knowledge or a conception of . “When I hear ‘that which is greater than everything that can be thought,’ which cannot be said to be anything other than God himself, I cannot think it or have it in the intellect on the basis of something I know from its species or genus. . . . For I neither know the thing itself, nor can I form an idea of it from something similar.” (S., p. 126-7)
Gaunilo continues along this line, arguing that the verbal formula employed in the argument is merely that, a verbal formula. The formula cannot really be understood, so it does not then really exist in the understanding. The signification or meaning of the terms can be thought, “but not as by a person who knows what is typically signified by this expression [voce], i.e. by one who thinks it on the basis of a thing that is true at least in thought alone.” (S., p. 127) Instead, what is actually being thought, according to Gaunilo, is vague. The signification or meaning of the terms is grasped only in a groping manner. “[I]t is thought as by one who does not know the thing and simply thinks on the basis of a movement of the mind produced by hearing this expression, trying to picture to himself the meaning of the expression perceived.” (S., p. 127) From this, Gaunilo concludes what he takes to be a denial of one of the premises of the argument: “So much then for the notion that that supreme nature is said to already exist in my understanding.” (S., p. 127)
A third problem that Gaunilo raises is that the argument could be applied to things other than God, things that are clearly imaginary, so that, if the argument were valid, it could be used to prove much more than Anselm intended, namely falsities. Here, the example of the Lost Island is introduced. “You can no longer doubt that this island excelling [praestantiorem] all other lands truly exists somewhere in reality, this island that you do not doubt to exist in your understanding; and since it is more excellent not to be in the understanding alone but also to be in reality, so it is necessary that it exists, since, if it did not, any other land that exists in reality would be more excellent than it.” (S., p. 128)
Anselm’s responses are long, detailed, and dense. Anselm notes Gaunillo’s alteration of the terms of the argument, and that this affects the force of the argument.
You repeat often that I say that, because what is greater than everything else [maius omnibus] is in the understanding, if it is the understanding it is in reality – for otherwise what is greater than everything else would not be greater than everything else – but such a proof [probatio] is found nowhere in all of the things I have said. For, saying “that which is greater than all” and “that than which nothing greater can be thought” do not have the same value for proving that what is being talked about is in reality. (S., p. 134)Therefore if, from what is said to be “greater than everything,” what “that than which nothing greater can be thought” proves of itself through itself [de se per seipsum] cannot be proved in a similar way, you have unjustly criticized me for having said what I did not say, when this differs so much from what I did say. (S., p. 135)
In Anselm’s view, Gaunilo demands a further argument precisely because he has not understood the argument as Anselm presented it. Anselm also affirms that we can understand the meaning of the term, “that than which nothing greater can be thought,” and that it is not simply a verbal formula.
Again, that you say that, when you hear it, you are not able to think or have in your mind “that than which a greater cannot be thought” on the basis of something known from its species or genus, so that you neither know the thing itself, nor can you form an idea of it from something similar. But quite evidently the matter is and remains otherwise [aliter sese habere]. For, every lesser good, insofar as it is good, is similar to a greater good. It is apparent to any reasonable mind that by ascending from lesser goods to greater ones, from those than which something greater can be thought, we are able to infer much [multum. . .conjicere] about that than which nothing greater can be thought. (S., p. 138)
Anselm notes a similarity between the terms “ineffable,” “unthinkable,” and “that than which nothing greater can be thought,” for in each case, it can be impossible for us to think or understand the thing referred to by the expression, but the expression can be thought and understood. Earlier on, Anselm makes a distinction that sheds additional light on this distinction between thinking and understanding the expression, and thinking and understanding the thing referred to by the expression. He also employs a useful metaphor. “[I]f you say that what is not entirely understood is not understood and is not in the understanding: say, then, that since someone is not able to gaze upon the purest light of the sun does not see light that is nothing but sunlight.” (S., p. 132) We do not have to fully and exhaustively understand what a term refers to in order for us to understand the term, and that applies to this case. “Certainly ‘that than which a greater cannot be thought’ is understood and is in the understanding at least to the extent [hactenus] that these things are understood of it.” (S., p. 132)
Anselm also clarifies the scope of his argument, indicating that it applies only to God: “I say confidently that if someone should find for me something existing either in reality or solely in thought, besides ‘that than which a greater cannot be thought,’ to which the schematic framework [conexionem] of my argument could rightly be adapted [aptare valeat], I will find and give him this lost island, nevermore to be lost.” (S., p. 134)
This earlier and considerably longer work includes an argument for God’s existence, but also much more discussion of the divine attributes and economy, and some discussion of the human mind. The proof Anselm provides in Chapter 1 is one he considers easiest for a person
who, either because of not hearing or because of not believing, does not know of the one nature, greatest of all things that are, alone sufficient to itself in its eternal beatitude, and who by his omnipotent goodness gives to and makes for all other things that they are something or that in some way they are well [aliquomodo bene sunt], and of the great many other things that we necessarily believe about God or about what he has created. (S., v. 1, p. 13)
The Monologion proof argues from the existence of many good things to a unity of goodness, a one thing through which all other things are good. Anselm first asks whether the diversity of good we experience through our senses and through our mind’s reasoning are all good through one single good thing, or whether there are different and multiple good things through which they are good. He recognizes, of course, that there are a variety of ways for things to be good things, and he also recognizes that many things are in fact good through other things. But, he is pushing the question further, since for every good thing B through which another good thing A is good, one can still ask what that good thing B is good through. If goods can even be comparable as goods, there must be some more general and unified way of regarding their goodness, or that through which they are good. Anselm argues: “you are not accustomed to considering something good except on an account of some usefulness, as health and those things that conduce to health are said to be good [propter aliquam utilitatem], or because of being of intrinsic value in some way [propter quamlibet honestatem], just as beauty and things that contribute to beauty are esteemed to be a good.” (S., p. 14)
This being granted, usefulness and intrinsic values can be brought to a more general unity. “It is necessary, for all useful or intrinsically valuable things, if they are indeed good things, that they are good through this very thing, through which all goods altogether [cuncta bona] must exist, whatever this thing might be.” (S., p. 14-5) This good alone is good through itself. All other good things are ultimately good through this thing, which is the superlative or supreme good. Certain corollaries can be drawn from this. One is that all good things are not only good through this Supreme Good; they are good, that is to say they have their being from the Supreme Good. Another is that “what is supremely good [summe bonum] is also supremely great [summe magnum]. Accordingly, there is one thing that is supremely good and supremely great, i.e. the highest [summum] of all things that are.” (S., p. 15) In Chapter 2, Anselm clarifies what he means by “great,” making a point that will assume greater importance in Chapter 15: “But, I am speaking about ‘great’ not with respect to physical space [spatio], as if it is some body, but rather about things that are greater [maius] to the degree that they are better [melius] or more worthy [dignus], for instance wisdom.” (S., p. 15)
Chapter 3 provides further discussion of the ontological dependence of all beings on this being. For any thing that is or exists, there must be something through which it is or exists. “For, everything that is, either is through [per] something or through nothing. But nothing is through nothing. For, it cannot be thought [non. . .cogitari potest] that something should be but not through something. So, whatever is, only is through something.” (S., p. 15-6) Anselm considers and rejects several possible ways of explaining how it is that all things are. There could be one single being through which all things have their being. Or there could be a plurality of beings through which other beings have their being. The second possibility allows three cases: “[I]f they are multiple, then either: 1) they are referred to some single thing through which they are, or 2) they are, individually [singula], through themselves [per se], or 3) they are mutually through each other [per se invicem].” (S., p. 16)
In the first case, they are all through one single being. In the second case, there is still some single power or nature of existing through oneself [existendi per se], common to all of them. Saying that they exist through themselves really means that they exist through this power or nature which they share. Again, they have one single ontological ground upon which they are dependent. One can propose the third case, but it is upon closer consideration absurd. “Reason does not allow that there would be many things [that have their being] mutually through each other, since it is an irrational thought that some thing should be through another thing, to which the first thing gives its being.” (S., p. 16)
For Anselm three things follow from this. First, there is a single being through which all other beings have their being. Second, this being must have its being through itself. Third, in the gradations of being, this being is to the greatest degree.
Whatever is through something else is less than that through which everything else together is, and that which alone is through itself. . . . So, there is one thing that alone, of all things, is, to the greatest degree and supremely [maxime et summe]. For, what of all things is to the greatest degree, and through which anything else is good or great, and through which anything else is something, necessarily that thing is supremely good and supremely great and the highest of all things that are. (S., p. 16)
Chapter 4 continues this discussion of degrees. In the nature of things, there are varying degrees (gradus) of dignity or worth (dignitas). The example Anselm uses is humorous and indicates an important feature of the human rational mind, namely its capacity to grasp these different degrees of worth. “For, one who doubts whether a horse in its nature is better than a piece of wood, and that a human being is superior to a horse, that person assuredly does not deserve to be called a human being.” (S., p. 17) Anselm argues that there must be a highest nature, or rather a nature that does not have a superior, otherwise the gradations would be infinite and unbounded, which he considers absurd. By argumentation similar to that of the previous chapters, he adduces that there can only be one such highest nature. The scale of gradations comes up again later in Chapter 31, where he indicates that creatures’ degrees of being, and being superior to other creatures, depends on their degree of likeness to God (specifically to the divine Word).
[E]very understanding judges natures in any way living to be superior to non-living ones, sentient natures to be superior to non-sentient ones, rational ones to be superior to irrational ones. For since the Supreme Nature, in its own unique manner, not only is but also lives and perceives and is rational, it is clear that. . . what in any way is living is more alike to the Supreme Nature than that which does not in any way live; and, what in any way, even by bodily sense, knows something is more like the Supreme Nature than what does not perceive at all; and, what is rational is more like the Supreme Nature than what is not capable of reason. (S., p. 49)
Through something akin to what analytic philosophers might term a thought-experiment and phenomenologists an eidetic variation, Anselm considers a being gradually stripped of reason, sentience, life, and then the “bare being” (nudum esse) that would be left: “[T]his substance would be in this way bit by bit destroyed, led by degrees (gradatim) to less and less being, and finally to non-being. And, those things that, when they are taken away [absumpta] one by one from some essence, reduce it to less and less being, when they are reassumed [assumpta] . . . lead it to greater and greater being.” (S., p. 49-50)
In the chapters that follow, Anselm indicates that the Supreme Nature derives its existence only from itself, meaning that it was never brought into existence by something else. Anselm uses an analogy to suggest how the being of the Supreme Being can be understood.
Therefore in what way it should be understood [intelligenda est] to be through itself and from itself [per se et ex se], if it does not make itself, not arise as its own matter, nor in any way help itself to be what it was not before?. . . .In the way “light” [lux] and “to light” [lucere] and “lighting” [lucens] are related to each other [sese habent ad invicem], so are “essence” [essentia] and “to be” [esse] and “being,” i.e. supremely existing or supremely subsisting. (S., p. 20)
This Supreme Nature is that through which all things have their being precisely because it is the Creator, which creates all beings (including the matter of created beings) ex nihilo.
In Chapters 8-14, the argument shifts direction, leading ultimately to a restatement of the traditional Christian doctrine of the Logos (the “Word” of God, the Son of the Father and Creator). The argumentation starts by examination of the meaning of “nothing,” distinguishing different senses and uses of the term. Creation ex nihilo could be interpreted three different ways. According to the first way, “what is said to have been made from nothing has not been made at all.” (S., p. 23) In another way, “something was said to be made from nothing in this way, that it was made from this very nothing, that is from that which is not; as if this nothing were something existing, from which something could be made.” (S., p. 23) Finally, there is a “third interpretation. . . when we understand something to be made but that there is not something from which it has been made.” (S., p. 23)
The first way, Anselm says, cannot be properly applied to anything that actually has been made, and the second way is simply false, so the third way or sense is the correct interpretation. In Chapter 9, an important implication of creation ex nihilo is drawn out “There is no way that something could come to be rationally from another, unless something preceded the thing to be made in the maker’s reason as a model, or to put it better a form, or a likeness, or a rule.” (S., p. 24) This, in turn implies another important doctrine: “what things were going to be, or what kinds of things or how the things would be, were in the supreme nature’s reason before everything came to be.” (S., p. 24) In subsequent chapters, the doctrine is further elaborated, culminating in this pattern being the utterance (locutio) of the supreme essence and the supreme essence, that is to say the Word (verbum) of the Father, while being of the same substance as the Father.
Chapter 15-28 examine, discuss, and argue for particular attributes of God, 15-17 and 28 being of particular interest. Chapter 15 is devoted to the matter of what can be said about the divine substance. Relative terms do not really communicate the essence of the divine being, even including expressions such as “the highest of all” (summa omnium) or “greater than everything that has been created by it” (maior omnibus . . .) “For if none of those things ever existed, in relation to which [God] is called “the highest” and “greater,” it would be understood to be neither the highest nor greater. But still, it would be no less good on that account, nor would it suffer any loss of the greatness of its essence. And this is obvious, for this reason: whatever may be good or great, this thing is not such through another but by its very self.” (S., p. 28)
There are still other ways of talking about the divine substance. One way is to say that the divine substance is “whatever is in general [omnino] better that what is not it. For, it alone is that than which nothing is better, and that which is better than everything else that is not what it is.” (S., p. 29) Given that explanation, while there are some things that it is better for certain beings to be rather than not to be, God will not be those things, but only what it is absolutely better to be than not to be. So, for instance, God will not be a body, but God will be wise or just. Anselm provides a partial listing of the qualities or attributes that do express the divine essence: “living, wise, powerful and all-powerful, true, just, happy, eternal, and whatever in like wise it is absolutely better to be than not to be.” (S., p. 29)
Anselm raises a problem in Chapter 16. Granted that God has these attributes, one might think that all that is being signified is that God is a being that has these attributes to a greater degree than other beings, not what God is. Anselm uses justice as the example, which is fitting since it is usually conceived of as something relational. Anselm first sets out the problem in terms of participation in qualities. “[E]verything that is just is just through justice, and similarly for other things of this sort. Accordingly, that very supreme nature is not just unless through justice. So, it appears that by participation in the quality, namely justice, the supremely good substance can be called just.” (S., p. 30) And this reasoning leads to the conclusion that the supremely good substance “is just through another, and not through itself.” (S., p. 30)
The problem is that God is what he is through himself, while other things are what they are through him. In the case of each divine attribute, as in the later Proslogion, God having that attribute is precisely that attribute itself, so that for instance, God is not just by some standard or idea of justice extrinsic to God himself, but rather God is God’s own justice, and justice in the superlative sense. Everything else canhave the attribute of justice, whereas God is justice. This argument can be extended to all of God’s attributes What is perceived to have been settled in the case of justice, the intellect is constrained by reason to judge [sentire] to be the case about everything that is said in a similar way about that supreme nature. Whichever of them, then, is said about the supreme nature, it is not how [qualis] nor how much [quanta] [the supreme nature has quality] that is shown [monstratur] but rather what it is. . . .Thus, it is the supreme essence, supreme life, supreme reason, supreme salvation [salus], supreme justice, supreme wisdom, supreme truth, supreme goodness, supreme greatness, supreme beauty, supreme immortality, supreme incorruptibility, supreme immutability, supreme happiness, supreme eternity, supreme power [potestas], supreme unity, which is nothing other than supreme being, supremely living, and other things in like wise [similiter]. (S., p. 30-1)
This immediately raises yet another problem, however, because this seems like a multiplicity of supreme attributes, implying that each is a particularly superlative way of being for God, suggesting that God is in some manner a composite. Instead, in God (not in any other being) each of these is all of the others. God’s being alone, as Chapter 28 argues, is being in an unqualified sense. All other beings, since they are mutable, or because they can be understood to have come from non-being, “barely (vix) exist or almost (fere) do not exist.” (S., p. 46)
Chapters 29-48 continue the investigation of the generation of the “utterance” or Word, the Son, from the Father in the divine economy, and 49-63 expand this to discussion of the love between the Father and the Son, namely the Holy Spirit, equally God as the Father and Son. 64-80 discuss the human creature’s grasp and understanding of God. Chapter 31 is of particular interest, and discusses the relationship between words or thoughts in human minds and the Word or Son by which all things were created by the Father. A human mind contains images or likenesses of things that are thought of or talked about, and a likeness is true to the degree that it imitates more or less the thing of which it is likeness, so that the thing has a priority in truth and in being over the human subject apprehending it, or more properly speaking, over the image, idea, or likeness by which the human subject apprehends the thing. In the Word, however, there are not likenesses or images of the created things, but instead, the created things are themselves imitations of their true essences in the Word.
The discussion in Chapters 64-80, which concludes the Monologion, makes three central points. First, the triune God is ineffable, and except in certain respects incomprehensible, but we can arrive at this conclusion and understand it to some degree through reason. This is because our arguments and investigations do not attain the distinctive character (proprietatem) of God. That does not present an insurmountable problem, however.
For often we talk about many things that we do not express properly, exactly as they really are, but we signify through another thing what we will not or can not bring forth properly, as for instance when we speak in riddles. And often we see something, not properly, exactly how the thing is, but through some likeness or image, for instance when we look upon somebody’s face in a mirror. Indeed, in this way we talk about and do not talk about, see and do not see, the same thing. We talk about it and see it through something else; we do not talk about it and see it through its distinctive character [proprietatem]Now, whatever names seem to be able to be said of this nature, they do not so much reveal it to me through its distinctive character as signify it [innuunt] to me through some likeness. (S., v. 1, p. 76)
Anselm uses the example of the divine attribute of wisdom. “For the name ‘wisdom’ is not sufficient to reveal to me that being through which all things were made from nothing and preserved from [falling into] nothing.” (S., p. 76)
The outcome of this is that all human thought and knowledge about God is mediated through something. Likenesses are never the thing of which they are a likeness, but there are greater and lesser degrees of likeness. This leads to the second point. Human beings come closer to knowing God through investigating what is closer to him, namely the rational mind, which is a mirror both of itself and, albeit in a diminished way, of God.
[J]ust as the rational mind alone among all other creatures is able to rise to the investigation of this Being, likewise it is no less alone that through which the rational mind itself can make progress towards investigation of that Being. For we have already come to know [jam cognitum est] that the rational mind, through the likeness of natural essence, most approaches that Being. What then is more evident than that the more assiduously the rational mind directs itself to learning about itself, the more effectively it ascends to the knowledge [cognitionem] of that Being, and that the more carelessly it looks upon itself, the more it descends from the exploration [speculatione] of that Being? (S., v. 1, p. 77)
Third, to be truly rational involves loving and seeking God, which in fact requires an effort to remember and understand God. “[I]t is clear that the rational creature ought to expend all of its capacity and willing [suum posse et velle] on remembering and understanding and loving the Supreme Good, for which purpose it knows itself to have its own being.” (S., p. 79)
The Monologion and Proslogion (although often only Chapters 2-4 of the latter) are typically studied by philosophers. The Cur Deus Homo (Why God Became Man) is more frequently studied by theologians, particularly since Anselm’s interpretation of the Atonement has been influential in Christian theology. The method, however, as in his other works, is primarily a philosophical one, attempting to understand truths of the Christian faith through the use of reasoning, granted of course, that this reasoning is applied to theological concepts. Anselm provides a twofold justification for the treatise, both responding to requests “by speech and by letter.” The first is for those asking Anselm to discuss the Incarnation, providing rational accounts (rationes) “not so that through reason they attain to faith, but so that they may delight in the understanding and contemplation of those things they believe, and so that they might be, as much as possible, 'always ready to satisfy all those asking with an account [rationem] for those things for which' we 'hope.'” (S., v. 2, p. 48)
The second is for those same people, but so that they can engage in argument with non-Christians. As Anselm says, non-believers make the question of the Incarnation a crux in their arguments against Christianity, “ridiculing Christian simplicity as foolishness, and many faithful are accustomed to turn it over in their hearts.” (S., p. 48) The question simply stated is this: “by what reason or necessity was God made man, and by his death, as we believe and confess, gave back life to the world, when he could have done this either through another person, either human or angelic, or through his will alone?” (S., p. 48)
In Chapter 3, Anselm’s interlocutor, his fellow monk and student Boso, raises several specific objections made by non-Christians to the Christian doctrine of the Incarnation: “we do injustice and show contempt [contumeliam] to God when we affirm that he descended into a woman’s womb, and that he was born of woman, that he grew nourished by milk and human food, and – so that I can pass over many other things that do not seem befitting to God– that he endured weariness, hunger, thirst, lashes, and the cross and death between thieves.” (S., v. 2, p. 51)
Anselm’s immediate response mirrors the structure of the Cur Deus Homo. Each of the points he makes are argued in fuller detail later in the work.
For it was fitting that, just as death entered into the human race by man’s disobedience, so should life be restored by man’s obedience. And, that, just as the sin that was the cause of our damnation had its beginning from woman, so the author of our justice and salvation should be born from woman. And, that the devil conquered man through persuading him to taste from the tree [ligni], should be conquered by man through the passion he endured on the tree [ligni]. (S., p. 51)
The first book (Chapters 1-25), produces a lengthy argument, involving a number of distinctions, discussions about the propriety of certain expressions and the entailments of willing certain things. Chapters 16-19 represent a lengthy digression involving questions about the number of angels who fell or rebelled against God, whether their number is to be made up of good humans, and related questions. The three most important parts of the argument take the form of these discussions: the justice and injustice of God, humans, and the devil; the entailments of the Father and the Son willing the redemption of humanity; the inability of humans to repay God for their sins.
Anselm distinguishes, as he does in the earlier treatise De Veritate, different ways in which an action or state can be just or unjust, specifically just and unjust at the same time, but not in the same way of looking at the matter. “For, it happens sometimes [contingit] that the same thing is just and unjust considered from different viewpoints [diversis considerationibus], and for this reason it is adjudged to be entirely just or entirely unjust by those who do not look at it carefully.” (S., p. 57) Humans are justly punished by God for sin, and they are justly tormented by the devil, but the devil unjustly torments humans, even though it is just for God to allow this to take place.“In this way, the devil is said to torment a man justly, because God justly permits this and the man justly suffers it. But, because a man is said to justly suffer, one does not mean that he justly suffers because of his own justice, but because he is punished by God’s just judgment.” (S., p. 57)
Not only distinguishing between different ways of looking at the same matter is needed, but also distinguishing between what is directly willed and what is entailed in willing certain things. On first glance, it could seem that God the Father directly wills the death of Jesus Christ, God the Son, or that the latter wills his own death. Indeed something like this has to be the case, because God does will the redemption of humanity, and this comes through the Incarnation and through Christ’s death and resurrection. According to Anselm, Christ dies as an entailment of what it is that God wills. “For, if we intend to do something, but propose to do something else first through which the other thing will be done, when what we chose to be first is done, if what we intend comes to be, it is correctly said to be done on account of the other…” (S., p. 62-3) Accordingly, what God willed (as both Father and Son) was the redemption of the human race, which required the death of Christ, and required this “not because the Father preferred the death of the Son over his life, but because the Father was not willing to restore the human race unless man did something as great as that death of Christ was.” (S., p. 63) As Anselm goes on to explain, the determination of the Son’s will then takes place within the structure of the Father’s will. “Since reason did not demand that another person do what he could not, for that reason the Son says that he wills his own death, which he preferred to suffer rather than that the human race not be saved.” (S., p. 63-4) What was involved in Christ’s death, therefore, was actually obedience on the part of the Son, following out precisely what was entailed by God’s willing to redeem humanity. The central point of the argument is then making clear why the redemption of humanity would have to involve the death of Christ. Articulating this, Anselm begins by discussing sin in terms of what is due or owed to (quod debet) God.
Sin is precisely not giving God what is due to him, namely: “[e]very willing [voluntas] of a rational creature should [debet] be subject to God’s will.” (S., p. 68) Doing this is justice or rightness of will, and is the “sole and complete debt of honor” (solus et totus honor), which is owed to God. Now, sin, understood as disobedience and contempt or dishonor, is not as simple, nor as simple to remedy, as it first appears. In the sinful act or volition, which already requires its own compensation, there is an added sin against God’s honor, which requires additional compensation. “But, so long as he does not pay for [solvit] what he has wrongly taken [rapuit], he remains in fault. Nor does it suffice simply to give back what was taken away, but for the contempt shown [pro contumelia illata] he ought to give back more than he took away.” (S., p. 68)
Anselm provides analogous examples: one endangering another’s safety ought to restore the safety, but also compensate for the anguish (illata doloris iniuria recompenset); violating somebody’s honor requires not only honoring the person again, but also making recompense in some other way; unjust gains should be recompensed not only by returning the unjust gain, but also by something that could not have otherwise been demanded.
The question then is whether it would be right for God to simply forgive humans sins out of mercy (misericordia), and the answer is that this would be unbefitting to God, precisely because it would contravene justice. It is really impossible, however, for humans to make recompense or satisfaction, that is to say, satisfy the demands of justice, for their sins. One reason for this is that one already owes whatever one would give God at any given moment. Boso suggests numerous possible recompenses: “[p]enitence, a contrite and humbled heart, abstinence and bodily labors of many kinds, and mercy in giving and forgiving, and obedience.” (S., p. 68)
Anselm responds, however: “When you give to God something that you owe him, even if you do not sin, you ought not reckon this as the debt that you own him for sin. For, you owe all of these things you mention to God.” (S., p. 68) Strict justice requires that a human being make satisfaction for sin, satisfaction that is humanly impossible. Absent this satisfaction, God forgiving the sin would violate strict justice, in the process contravening the supreme justice that is God. A human being is doubly bound by the guilt of sin, and is therefore “inexcusable” having “freely [sponte] obligated himself by that debt that he cannot pay off, and by his fault cast himself down into this impotency, so that neither can he pay back what he owed before sinning, namely not sinning, nor can he pay back what he owes because he sinned.” (S., p. 92)
Accordingly, humans must be redeemed through Jesus Christ, who is both man and God, the argument for which comes in Book II, starting in Chapter 6, and elaborated through the remainder of the treatise, which also treats subsidiary problems. The argument at its core is that only a human being can make recompense for human sin against God, but this being impossible for any human being, such recompense could only be made by God. This is only possible for Jesus Christ, the Son, who is both God and man, with (following the Chalcedonian doctrine) two natures united but distinct in the same person (Chapter7). The atonement is brought about by Christ’s death, which is of infinite value, greater than all created being (Chapter 14), and even redeems the sins of those who killed Christ (Chapter 15). Ultimately, in Anselm’s interpretation of the atonement, divine justice and divine mercy in the fullest senses are shown to be entirely compatible.
This dialogue stands on its own in the Anselmian corpus, and focuses on untangling some puzzles about language, qualities, and substances. Anselm’s solutions to the puzzles involve making needed distinctions at proper points, and making explicit what particular expressions are meant to express. The dialogue ends with the puzzles resolved, but also with Anselm signaling the provisional status of the conclusions reached in the course of investigation. He cautions the student: “Since I know how much the dialecticians in our times dispute about the question you brought forth, I do not want you to stick to the points we made so that you would hold them obstinately if someone were to be able to destroy them by more powerful arguments and set up others.” (S., v. 1, p.168)
The student begins by asking whether “expert in grammar” (grammaticus) is a substance or a quality. The question, and the discussion, has a wider scope, however, since once that is known, “I will recognize what I ought to think about other things that are similarly spoken of through derivation [denominative].” (S., p.144)
There is a puzzle about the term “expert in grammar,” and other like terms, because a case, or rather an argument, can be made for either option, meaning it can be construed to be a substance or a quality. The student brings forth the argument.
That every expert in grammar is a man, and that every man is a substance, suffice to prove that expert in grammar is a substance. For, whatever the expert in grammar has that substance would follow from, he has only from the fact that he is a man. So, once it is conceded that he is a man, whatever follows from being a man follows from being an expert in grammar. (S., v. 1, p.144-5)
At the same time, philosophers who have dealt with the subject have maintained that it is a quality, and their authority is not to be lightly disregarded. So, there is a serious and genuine problem. The term must signify either a substance or a quality, and cannot do both. One option must be true and the other false, but since there are arguments to be made for either side, it is difficult to tell which one is false.
The teacher responds by pointing out that the options are not necessarily incompatible with each other. Before explaining how this can be so, he asks the student to lay out the objections against both options. The student begins by attacking the premise “expert in grammar is a man” (grammaticum esse hominem) with two arguments
No expert in grammar can be understood [intelligi] without reference to grammar, and every man can be understood without reference to grammar.Every expert in grammar admits of [being] more and less, and No man admits of [being] more or less From either one of these linkings [contextione] of two propositions one conclusion follows, i.e. no expert in grammar is a man. (S., p.146)
The teacher states, however, that this conclusion does not follow from the premises, and uses a similar argument to illustrate his point. The term “animal” signifies “animate substance capable of perception,” which can be understood without reference to rationality. The teacher then gets the student to admit to a further proposition, “every animal can be understood without reference to rationality, and no animal is from necessity rational,” to which he adds: “But no man can be understood without reference to rationality, and it is necessary that every man be rational.” (S., p.147) The implication, which the student sees and would like to avoid, is the clearly false conclusion, “no man is an animal.” On the other hand, the student does not want to give up the connection between man and rationality.
The teacher indicates a way out of the predicament by noting that the false conclusions are arrived at by inferring from the premises in a mechanical way, without examining what is in fact being expressed by the premises, without making proper distinctions based on what is being expressed, and without restating the premises as propositions more adequately expressing what the premises are supposed to assert. The teacher begins by asking the student to make explicit what the man, and the expert in grammar, are being understood as with or without reference to grammar. This allows the premises in the student’s arguments to be more adequately restated.
Every man can be understood as man without reference to grammar. No expert in grammar can be understood as expert in grammar without reference to grammar.No man is more or less man, and Every expert in grammar is more or less an expert in grammar. (S., v. 1, p.148-9)
In both cases, it is now apparent that where it seemed previously there was a common term, and therefore a valid syllogism, there is in fact no common term. This does not mean that nothing can be validly inferred from them. But, in order for something to be validly inferred, a common term must be found. The teacher advises: “The common term of a syllogism should be not so much in the expression brought forward [in prolatione] as in meaning [in sententia].” (S., p.149) The reasoning behind this is that what “binds the syllogism together” is the meaning of the terms used, not the mere words, “For just as nothing is accomplished if the term is common in language [in voce] but not in meaning [in sensu], likewise nothing impedes us if it is in our understanding [in intellectu] but not in the expression brought forward [in prolatione].” (S., p.149)
The first set of premises of the of the student’s double argument can be reformulated then as the following new premises.
To be a man does not require grammar, and
To be an expert in grammar requires grammar. (S., p.149)
Thus restated, the premises do have a common term, and a conclusion can be inferred from them namely: “To be an expert in grammar is not to be a man, i.e., there is not the same definition for both of them.” (S., p.149) What this conclusion means is not that an expert in grammar is not a man, but rather that they are not identical, they do not have the same definition. Other syllogisms, appearing at first glance valid but terminating in false conclusions, can similarly be transformed. One that deals directly with the student’s initial question runs:
Every expert in grammar is spoken of as a quality [in eo quod quale].
No man is spoken of as a quality.
Thus, no man is an expert in grammar. (S., p.150)
The premises can be reformulated according to their meaning:
Every expert in grammar is spoken of as expert in grammar as a quality.
No man is spoken of as man as a quality. (S., p.150)
It is now apparent that again there is no middle term, and the conclusion does not validly follow. The student explores various possible syllogisms that might be constructed before the teacher indicates that the student, who ends with the conclusion, “the essence of man is not the essence of expert in grammar,” (S., p.150) has not fully grasped the lesson. The teacher brings in a further distinction, that of respect or manner (modo). This requires attention to what is actually being signified by the expressions “man,” and “expert in grammar.” An expert in grammar, who is a man, can be understood as a man without reference to grammar, so in some respect an expert in grammar can be understood without reference to grammar (that is, understood as man, not as an expert in grammar, which he nonetheless still is). And, a man, who is an expert in grammar, who is to be understood as an expert in grammar, cannot be so understood without reference to grammar.
Another puzzle can be raised about man and expert in grammar, bearing on being present in a subject. An argument clearly going against Aristotle’s intentions can be derived by using one of his statements as a premise.
Expert in grammar is among those things that are in a subject.
And, no man is in a subject.
So, no expert in grammar is a man. (S., p.154)
The teacher again directs the student to pay close attention to the meaning of what is being said. When one speaks about an “expert in grammar,” the things that are signified are “man” and “grammar.” Man is a substance, and is not present in a subject, but grammar is a quality and is present in a subject. So, depending on what way one looks at it, someone can say that expert in grammar is a substance and is not in a subject, if they mean “expert in grammar” insofar as the expert in grammar is a man (secundum hominem). Alternately, one can say that expert in grammar is a quality and is in a subject, if they mean “expert in grammar” with respect to grammar (secundum grammaticam). Similarly, “expert in grammar” can be regarded, from different points of view, as being primary or secondary substance, or as neither.
“Expert in grammar” has been shown to be able to be both a substance and a quality, so that there is no inconsistency between them. The student then raises a related problem, asking why “man” cannot similarly be a substance and a quality. “For man signifies a substance along with all those differentia that are in man, such as sensibility and mortality.” (S., p.156) The teacher points out that the case of “man” is not similar to that of “expert in grammar.” “[Y]ou do not consider how dissimilarly the name ‘man’ signifies those things of which a man consists, and how expert in grammar [signifies] man and grammar. Truly, the name ‘man’ signifies by itself and as one thing those things of which the entire man consists.” (S., p.156)
“Expert in grammar,” however, signifies “man” and “grammar” in different ways. It signifies “grammar” by itself (per se); it signifies “man” by something else (per aliud). Expertise in grammar is an accident of man, so “expert in grammar” cannot signify “man” in any unconditioned sense, but rather is something said of man (appellative hominis). The man is the underlying substance in which there can be grammar, and the underlying substance can be expert in grammar.
So, “expert in grammar” can rightly be understood in accordance with Aristotle’s Categories as a quality, because it signifies a quality. At the same time, “expert in grammar” is said of a substance, that is to say, man. This still raises some problems in the mind of the student, who suggests “expert in grammar” could be a having, or under the category of having, and asks whether a single thing can be of several categories. The teacher, conceding that the issue requires further study, maintains, directing the student through several examples, that a single expression that signifies more than one thing can be in more than one category, provided the things that are signified are not signified as actually one thing.
This dialogue, which Anselm describes in its preface as one of “three treatises pertaining to the study of Sacred Scripture,” dealing with “what truth is, in what things [quibus rebus] truth is customarily said to be, and what justice is” (S., v. 1, p. 173), begins with a student asking for a definition of truth. The dialogical lesson takes the truth of statements as a starting point. A statement is true “[w]hen what it states [quod enuntiat], whether in affirming or in negating, is so [est].” (S., v. 1, p. 177) Given this, Anselm’s theory of truth appears at first glance a simple correspondence theory, where truth consists in the correspondence between statements and states of affairs signified by those statements.
His theory is more complex, however, and relies on a Platonic notion of participation, or more accurately stated, weds together a correspondence theory with a Platonic participational view. “[N]othing is true except by participating in truth; and so the truth of the true thing is in the true thing itself. But truly the thing stated is not in the true statement. So, it [the thing stated] should not be called its truth, but the cause of its truth. For this reason it seems to me that the truth of the statement should be sought only in the language itself [ipsa oratione].” (S., v. 1, p. 177) It is very important at this point to keep in mind that Anselm is not saying that all truth is simply in language, but rather that the truth of statements, truth of signification, lies in the language used. The truth of the statement cannot be the statement itself, nor can it be the statement’s signifying, nor the statement’s “definition,” for in any of these cases, the statement would always be true. Instead, statements are true when they signify correctly or rightly, and Anselm provides the key term for his larger theory of truth, “rectitude” or “rightness.” “Therefore its [an affirmation’s] truth is not something different than rightness [rectitudo].” (S., p. 178)
Anselm notes, however, that even when a statement affirms that what-is-not is, or vice versa, there is stillsome truth or correctness to the statement. This is so because there are two kinds of truth in signifying, for a statement can signify that what is the case is the case, and it does signify what it signifies. “There is one rightness and truth of the statement because it signifies what it was made to signify [ad quod significandum facta est]; and, there is another, when it signifies that which it received the capacity to signify [quod accepit significare].” (S., p. 179)
Accordingly, for Anselm, the truth of statements consists in part in the correspondence of the statement to the state of affairs signified, but also in the signification itself, the sense or meaning of the statement. “It always possesses the latter kind of truth, but does not always possess the former. For, it has the latter kind naturally, but the former kind accidentally and according to usage.” (S., p.179) For example, the expression “it is day” always possesses the second kind of truth, since the expression can always signify what it does signify; in other words, it can convey a meaning. But, whether or not it possesses the first kind of truth depends on whether in fact it is day. According to Anselm, in certain statements, the two kinds of truth or correctness are inseparable from each other, examples of these being universal statements, such as “man is an animal.”
He goes on to discuss truth of other kinds, in thought, in the will, in action, in the senses, and in the being of things. Truth in thought is analogous to truth in signification, but Anselm discusses only the first kind of truth, where thoughts correspond to actual states of affairs, this being “rightness” of thought. Truth in the will likewise consists in rightness, in other words, willing what it is that one ought to will. With respect to actions, again truth is rightness, in this case goodness. “To do good [bene facere] and to do evil [male facere] are contraries. For this reason, if to do the truth [veritatem facere] and to do good are the same in opposition, they are not different in their signification. . . . [T]o do what is right [rectitudinem facere] is to do the truth… Nothing is more apparent then than that the truth of an action is its rightness.” (S., p. 182)
But Anselm distinguishes between natural actions, such as a fire heating, which are non-rational and necessary, and non-natural actions, such as giving alms, which are rational and non-necessary. The natural type is always true, like the second kind of truth in signification. The non-natural type is sometimes true, sometimes false, like the first kind of truth in signification. Truth of the senses, Anselm argues, is a misnomer, as the truth or falsity involving the senses is not in the senses but in the “judgment” (in opinione). “The inner sense itself makes an error [se fallit], rather than the exterior sense lying to it.” (S., p. 183)
Speaking of the second kind of truth in signification, and of the truth of natural actions involves reference to a “Supreme Truth,” namely, God. Everything that is, insofar as it is receives its being [quod est] from the Supreme Truth. An argument, placed in the mouth of the dialogue’s teacher, follows from this: 1) “If all things are this, i.e. what they are there [in the Supreme Truth], without a doubt they are what they ought to be.” 2) “But whatever is what it ought to be is rightly [recte est]. “Thus, everything that is, is rightly.” (S, p. 185)
This, however, seems to present a genuine and serious problem, given the existence and experience of evil, specifically, “many deeds done evilly” (multa opera male), in the world as we know it. In order to address this, Anselm resorts to the traditional distinction between God causing and God permitting evil. Evil actions and evil willing ought not to be, but what happens when God permits it, because He permits it, ought to be. The solution to this puzzle lies in further distinction. “For in many ways the same matter [eadem res] supports opposites when considered from different perspectives [diversis considerationibus]. This often happens to be the case for an action. . . .” (S., p. 187)
Anselm uses the example of a “beating” (percussio), which can be regarded both as an action, on the part of the agent, and as a passion, on the part of the passive sufferer. Both the active and the passive are necessarily connected. “For a beating is of the one acting and of the one suffering, whence it can be said of either the action [giving a beating] and the passion [getting a beating].” (S., p. 187) While these two are necessarily connected, the same is not true of the judgments that can be made regarding each side of the action, for instance the rightness of the action or the suffering. A person might be rightly beaten, but it may be wrong for this or that person to give the beating. The implication of this is that “it can happen that according to nature an action or a passion should be, but in respect to the person acting or the person suffering should not be, since neither should the former do it nor the latter suffer it.” (S., p. 188) In this case, and other similar cases, it is possible for the same thing to have seemingly contradictory determinations. The key here, however, is that the same thing is being “considered from different perspectives [diversis considerationibus]” (S., p. 188)
Anselm then brings all of the other kinds of truth back to the truth of signification, not reducing them all to signification, but rather indicating how they are connected to each other. “For, there is true or false signification not only in those things we are accustomed to call signs but also in all of the other things that we have spoken of. For, since something should not be done by someone unless it is something that someone should do, by the very fact that someone does something, he says and he signifies that he ought to do that thing.” (S., p. 189) In every action, according to this doctrine, there is an implicit assertion of truth being made (rightly or wrongly) by the agent. For example, an expert tells a non-expert that certain herbs are non-poisonous, but avoids eating them, his action’s (true) signification being more trustworthy than his (false) signification in his statement. This applies even further.
So likewise, if you did not know that one ought not to lie and somebody lied in your presence, then even if he were to tell you that he himself ought not to lie, he would himself tell you more by his deed [opere] that he ought to lie than by his words that he ought not [to lie]. Similarly, when somebody thinks of or wills something, if you did not know whether he ought to will or think of that thing, and if you could see his willing or his thought, he would signify to you by that very action [ipso opere] that he ought to think about and will that thing. And, if he did ought to do so, he would speak the truth. But if not, he would lie. (S., p. 189)
In Anselm’s parlance, it is possible for action, willing, and thinking to be false, in other words, to be lies on the part of the acting, willing, or thinking subject. This involves a reference, noted earlier, to the Supreme Truth, God, more specifically to the truth of the being of things as they are in the Supreme Truth. All of the types of truth or rightness are ultimately determined or conditioned by the Supreme Truth, which is “the cause of all other truths and rightnesses.” Some of these other truths are themselves in turn causes as well as effects, while others are simply effects. “Since the truth that is in the existence of things is an effect of the Supreme Truth, this is also the cause of the truth belonging to thoughts and the truth that is in propositions; but these two truths are not the cause of any truth.” (S., p. 189)
After having carried out these dialogic investigations of the various kinds of truth, Anselm is now ready to provide a definition: “Accordingly, unless I am mistaken, we can establish the definition that [definire quia] truth is rightness perceptible only to the mind.” (S., p. 191) This introduces the final discussion of the dialogue, the student asking: “But since you have taught me that all truth is rightness, and since rightness seems to me to be the same thing as justice, teach me also what I might understand justice to be.” (S., p. 191) The teacher’s first response is that justice, truth, and rightness are convertible with each other. “[W]hen we are speaking of rightness perceptible only to the mind, truth and rightness and justice are mutually defined in relation to each other [invicem sese definiunt].” (S., p. 192) This relationship allows the rational investigating human being to use one of these terms, or rather their understanding of the meaning of the terms, to arrive at understanding of the others (which is in fact what is going on in the dialogue itself) “[I]f somebody knows one of them and does not know the others, he can extend his knowledge [scientiam pertingere] though the known to the unknown. Verily, whoever knows one cannot not know the other two.” (S., p. 192)
Justice, however, has a sense more specific and appropriate to humans, “the justice to which praise is owed, just as to its contrary, namely injustice, condemnation is owed.” (S., p. 192) This sort of justice, Anselm argues, resides only in beings that know rightness, and therefore can will it. Accordingly, this kind of justice is present only in rational beings, and in human beings, it is not in knowledge or action but in the will. Justice is then defined as “rightness of will,” and as this could allow instances where one wills rightly, in other words what he or she ought to will, without wanting to be in such a situation, or instances where one does so want, but wills the right object for a bad motive, the definition of justice is further specified as “rightness of will kept for its own sake” (propter se servata). Anselm makes clear that this uprightness is received from God prior to the human being having it, willing it, or keeping it. And, it is in a certain way radically dependent on God’s own justice. “If we say that [God’s] uprightness is kept for its own sake, we do not seem to be able to suitably [conuenienter] speak likewise about any other rightness. For just as [God’s uprightness] itself and not some other thing, preserves itself, it is not through another but through itself, and likewise not on account of another thing but on account of itself.” (S., p. 196)
This leads to the final topic of the De Veritate, the unity of truth. According to Anselm, although there is a multiplicity of true things, and multiple and different ways for things to be truth, there is ultimately only one truth, prior to all of these, and in which they participate. From the discussions in earlier treatises, it is clear that this single and ultimate truth is, of course, God.
This treatise is the second of the three treatises pertaining to the study of Sacred Scripture, and it deals primarily with the nature of the human will and its relation to the justice or rightness of will discussed at the end of the De Veritate. The student begins by asking the central questions:
Since free choice [liberum arbitrium] seems to be opposed to God’s grace, and predestination, and foreknowledge, I desire to know what this free choice is and whether we always have it. For if free choice is “to be able to sin and not sin,” just as it is customarily said by some people, and we always have it, in what way can we be in need of any grace? For if we do not always have it, why is sin imputed to us when we would sin without free choice. (S., v. 1, p. 207)
The immediate response is the denial that freedom of choice is or includes the ability to sin, for this would mean that God and the good angels, who cannot sin, would not have free choice. Anselm is unwilling even to entirely distinguish free choice of God and good angels from that of humans. “Although the free choice of humans differs from the free choice of God and the good angels, still the definition of this freedom, in accordance with this name, ought to be the same in either case.” (S., p. 208)
It appears at first that a will which can turn towards sinning or not sinning is more free, but this is to be able to lose what befits and what is useful or advantageous for (quod decet et quod expedit) the one willing. To be able to sin is actually an ability to become more unfree. Key to the argument is that not sinning is understood as a positive condition of maintaining uprightness or righteousness (rectitudo). Anselm makes two key points in support of this. “The will that cannot turn away from the righteousness of not sinning is thereby freer than one that can desert it [righteousness].” (S., p. 208) The analysis of the conceptions of freedom, sin, and power are similar to those in Proslogion Chapter 7: “The ability to sin, therefore, which when added to the will decreases its freedom and when taken away increases it, is neither freedom nor a part of freedom.” (S., v. 1, p. 209)
This raises two problems, however. Both the fallen angels and the first human were able to sin and did sin. Given the argument just made, being able to sin and freedom seem foreign (aliena) to each other, but if one does not sin from free choice, it seems one must sin of necessity. In addition, the notion of being a “servant of sin” requires clarification, specifically explaining how a free being can be mastered by sin, and thereby become a servant. Anselm makes a subtle distinction. In the case of the first man or the fallen angel, the Devil:
He sinned by his choice which was free, but not through that from which [unde] it was free, i.e. by the ability through which he was able to [per potestatem qua poterat] not sin and to not serve sin, but rather by the ability of sinning that he had [per potestatem quam habebat peccandi], by which he was neither aided toward the freedom of not sinning nor compelled to the service of sinning. (S., v. 1, p. 210)
Analogously to this, if somebody is able to be the servant of sin, this does not mean that sin is able to master him, so that his choice to sin, to become a servant of sin, is not free. Another question arises then, how a person, after becoming a servant of sin, would still be free, to which the answer is that one still retains some natural freedom of choice, but is unable to use one’s freedom of choice in exactly the same way as one could prior to choosing to sin. (Later in Chapter 12, Anselm clarifies that being a “servant of sin” is precisely “an inability to avoid sinning.”)
The difference, however, is all important. The freedom of choice which they originally possessed was oriented towards an end, that of “willing what they ought to will and what is advantageous for them to will,” (S., p. 211) in other words, uprightness or righteousness (rectitudo) of will. Anselm then considers four different possible ways in which they had this freedom oriented towards righteousness or uprightness of will:
The first three possibilities are rejected, leaving only the fourth. Rational creatures were originally given uprightness of will, which they were obliged to keep, but free (in one sense) to keep or lose. Freedom of choice, however, has a reason, namely, keeping this original uprightness-of-will for its own sake.
There are then two different possible states. So long as one keeps uprightness-of-will for its own sake, one does so freely. Once one loses uprightness-of-will through use of one’s free choice, one no longer has the ability to keep uprightness-of-will, really by definition, since one has after all lost it. Here, Anselm clarifies: “Even if uprightness of will is lacking, still [a] rational nature does not possess less than what belongs to it. For, as I view it, we have no ability that by itself suffices unto itself for its action; and still, when those things are lacking without which our abilities can hardly be brought to action, we still no less say that we have those abilities that are in us.” (S., p. 212-3)
He employs two analogies, one general, and one more specific. One can have an ability or an instrument that can accomplish something, but when the conditions for its employment are lacking, it cannot by itself bring anything about. Likewise, seeing a mountain requires not only sight, but also light and a mountain actually being there to be seen. When uprightness of will is lacking, having been lost, one still has theability to keep it, but the conditions for having and keeping it are lacking. “What prevents us from having the power of keeping uprightness of will for sake of that very uprightness, even if this very uprightness is absent, so long as within us there is reason, by which we are able to recognize it, and will, by which we are able to hold onto it? For the freedom of choice spoken of here consists in both of these [ex his enim constat].” (S., p. 214)
Chapters 5-9 discuss temptation, specifically how the will can be overcome by temptation, thereby turning away from or losing uprightness-of-will, by willing an action (for example, lying, murder, theft, adultery) contrary to God’s will. Anselm concedes that a person can be placed in a situation where options are constrained, and where unwelcome consequences follow from every option, for instance, when a person is constrained to choose between lying and thereby avoiding death (for a while), and dying. The will is stronger than any temptation, or even the Devil himself, but both temptation and the Devil can create difficulties for the resisting person, and can constrain the situations of choice. In these cases, the will can allow itself to be overcome. This still involves free choice of the will, but this is a free choice for one sort of unfreedom or another. Anselm argues that “a rational nature always possesses free choice, since it always possesses the ability of keeping uprightness of will for the sake of this rightness itself, even though with difficulty at some times.” (S., p. 222)
Once this uprightness has been lost, or rather abandoned freely, the free human being becomes a servant of sin because it cannot by itself regain that uprightness on its own. “Indeed, just as no will, before it possessed uprightness, was able to acquire it unless God gave it, so, after it deserted what it had received, it is not able to regain it unless God gives it back.” (S., p. 222) In such a condition, a human being remains free in the sense that they could keep uprightness-of-will, in other words, not sin, precisely by freely choosing to keep it, if they had it, which they do not. Once God gives it again, a human being is then once again free to keep it or to lose it. Freedom in the full sense for Anselm, therefore, consists in the ability to keep uprightness-of-will for its own sake, that is to say, choosing and acting in such a way as to keep oneself from losing it, even when faced with temptation.
This dialogue, considerably longer than the preceding De Veritate and De Libertate, further develops certain themes they raised, and addresses several other philosophical issues of major importance, including the nature of evil and negation, and the complexities of the will. The dialogue begins in an attempt to understand the implications of all created beings having nothing that they have not received from God. “No creature has anything [aliud] from itself. For what does not even have itself from itself, in what way could it have anything from itself?” (S., v. 1, p. 233) Only God, the Creator, alone has anything (quidquid) from himself. All other beings, as dependent on God for their being, have what they have from him. The student raises an initial problem in Chapter 1, having to do with divine causation. It seems then that God is the cause not only of created beings having something, and for their being, but also that God is then the cause for their passing into non-being. This would then mean that God is the cause not only for whatever is, but also for whatever is not.
The teacher makes a needed distinction here. A thing is said to cause another thing to be in several different cases. One who actually causes something else to be is properly said to cause it. When one able to cause something not to be does not so cause it, and then the thing is (because the first thing does not interfere with the second thing being or coming to be), the first thing is improperly said to cause the second. Accordingly, God is said to cause things in both ways. God is also improperly said to cause what is not not to be, when what is actually meant by this is that God simply does not cause it to be. Likewise, when things pass from being to not-being, God does not cause this, even though he does not conserve them in being, because they simply return to their original state of non-being.
This has a bearing on the question of divine responsibility for evil, setting up the other problems of the dialogue.
Just as nothing that is not good comes from the Supreme Good, and every good is from the Supreme Good, likewise nothing that is not being [essentia] comes from the Supreme Being [essentia], and all being is from the Supreme Being. Since the Supreme Good is the Supreme Being, it follows that every being is a good thing and every good thing is a being. Therefore, just as nothing and non-being [non esse] are not being [essentia], likewise they are not good. So, nothing and non-being are not from He from whom nothing is unless it is good and being. (S., p. 235)
The central problem is that of understanding how the Devil could be responsible for his own sin, given that what he has he has from God, and the lengthy argumentation in Chapter 3 sets in clear light the problem’s complex nature. It seems that there is an inconsistency between God’s goodness and the justness of his judgment, on the one hand, and the Devil not receiving perseverance from God who did not give it to him, on the other hand. The student is making the global assumption, however, that since giving X is the cause of X being received, not giving X is the cause of X not being received.
In some cases this does not hold, however, and the teacher supplies an example. “If I offer [porrigo] you something, and you accept it [accipis], I do not therefore give it because you receive it [accipis], but you therefore receive it because I give it, and the giving is the cause of the receiving.” (S., p. 236) In that positive case, the giving is the cause of the receiving, but, if the case is made negative the order of causing what takes place (or rather what does not take place) is the opposite. “What if I offer that very thing to someone else and he does not accept it? Does he therefore not accept it because I do not give it?” The student realizes that the proper way of looking at matters is “rather that you do not give it because he does not accept it.” (S., p. 236) In cases like these, where not-giving X is not the cause of X not being received, if one does not give X, it can still be inferred that X is not received. This answer does not quell the student’s initial misgivings, however, for it simply pushes the fundamental problem back further. “If you wish to assert that God did not give to him because he did not receive, I ask: why did he not receive? Was it because he was not able to, or because he did not will to? For if he did not have the ability or the will to receive [potestatem aut uoluntatem accipiendi], God did not give it.” (S., p. 237) This seems to place the responsibility for the Devil’s lack back on God, and the student asks: “[I]f he was not able to have the ability or the will to receive perseverance unless God gives it, in what did he sin, by not accepting what God did not give him to be able or to will to receive [posse aut uelle accipere]?” (S., p. 237)
The answer is that God in fact did give this ability and will, and the student concludes that the Devil did receive perseverance from God. The teacher makes two important clarifications. The first is that “I did not say that God gave him the receiving of perseverance [accipere perseuerantiam], but rather to be able or to will to [posse aut uelle] receive perseverance.” (S., p. 237) The student then concludes that since the Devil willed to and was able to (voluit et potuit) receive perseverance, he did in fact receive it.
This leads to the second, much more involved clarification. There are cases where one is able to and wills to do something, but does not finish it or bring it about completely or perfectly, cases where one’s initial will is changed before the thing is entirely finished.
T: Then, you willed and you were able to persevere in what you did not persevere.
S: Certainly I willed to, but I did not persevere in willing [in voluntate], and so I did not persevere in the action.
T: Why did you not persevere in willing?
S: Because I did not will to.
T: But, so long as you willed to persevere in the action, you willed to persevere in that willing [in voluntate]? (S., p. 238)
The will is marked by a reflexivity, as the student recognizes when the teacher asks why he did not persevere in willing. One can answer that he did not persevere in willing (which is the reason he did not then continue to will) because he did not will to. This type of explanation could be iterated infinitely, and would not really explain anything thereby. Instead, the explanation for failure of will (defectus. . . uoluntatis) requires reference to something else, and this requires coining a new expression. As the teacher says: “Let us say. . . . that to persevere in willing is to ‘will completely’ [peruelle].”(S., p. 238) And, he asks his student: “When, therefore, you did not complete what you willed to and were able to, why did you not complete it?” In response, the student supplies the conclusion: “Because I did not will it completely.” (S., p. 238) This allows a partial resolution to the problem: even though the Devil received the will and the ability to receive perseverance and the will and the ability to persevere, he did not actually receive the perseverance because he did not will it completely. Again, this answer simply pushes the problem to yet another level, leading the student to ask:
Again I ask why he did not will completely. For when you say that what he willed he did not completely will, you are saying something like: What he willed at first, he did not will later. So, when he did not will what he willed before, why did he not will it unless because he did not have the will to? And by this latter I do not mean the will that he had previously when he willed it but the one that he did not have when he did not will it. But why did he not have this will, unless because he did not receive it? And, why did he not receive it, unless because God did not give it? (S., p. 239)
The teacher reminds the student of the point established earlier, that God did not give to the Devil because the Devil did not receive. Again the failure is on the side of the creature, and at this point, the teacher asserts that the Devil could have received keeping (tenere) what he had but instead abandoned or deserted it (deseruit). The relation between not-receiving and desertion has a parallel structure to not-giving and not-receiving: the Devil did not receive because he deserted, and God did not give to the Devilbecause the Devil did not receive.
Once again, this is only a partial solution, and it still seems that God could be responsible for the fall of the Devil, because God did not give something to the Devil, namely the will to keep, not to desert, what he had. The cause for someone deserting something, the student claims, is because that person does not will to keep it. The teacher’s response here is similar to the previous responses, since he distinguishes cases where the causal relation the student asserts to hold does not hold. It is dissimilar, however, and brings the complex argumentation of Chapter 3 to a close, because it introduces the key notion of conflicting objects of the will. Using the example of a miser who would will both to keep his money and to have bread, which requires him to spend money, the teacher notes that in this case, willing to desert is prior to not willing to keep some good, precisely because one wills to desert the thing in order to have something that one prefers to have. In the case of the Devil then:
the reason he did not will when he should have and what he should have was not that his will was deficient [defecit] because God failed [deo . . .deficiente] to give, but rather that the Devil himself, by willing what he should not have, expelled his good will because of an evil will arising. Accordingly, it was not because he did not have a good persevering will or he did not receive it, because God did not give it, but rather that God did not give it because the Devil, by willing what he should not have, deserted the good will, and by deserting it did not keep it. (S., p. 240)
In Chapters 4-28, issues raised by this solution to the problem are explored: the complex nature of the will, and the ontological status of evil, nothing, and injustice. Chapter 4 introduces a key distinction in objects of the will, between justice (justitia) and what is beneficial, useful, or agreeable (commodum). The case of the Devil is the case for rational, willing creatures generally. The teacher notes: “He could not have willed anything except for justice or what is beneficial. For, happiness, which all rational natures will, consists of beneficial things.” And, the student confirms this: “We can recognize this in ourselves, who will nothing except what we deem to be just or beneficial.” (S., p. 241)
The Devil went wrong by willing something beneficial, but which he did not have and was not supposed to have at the time he willed it; this was to will in a disordered manner (inordinate), and hereby to will the beneficial thing in such a way as to thereby not keep justice, precisely because willing the beneficial thing in a disordered way required abandoning justice. The Devil willed to be both like God and above God, by willing in such a way as to reject the order God introduced into things (including wills), or put in another way, using a term that somewhat resists translation: “he willed something by his very own will alone [propria voluntate], which was subject [subdita] to nobody. For it should be for God alone to so will something by his very own will alone, so that he does not follow a will superior [to his own].” (S., p. 242)
The will, in both angels and human beings, is complex, and can be regarded from different though complementary points of view, and in terms of its objects, which may differ or coincide. Chapters 12-14 discuss the relationships between the will, happiness, and justice. There are two fundamental kinds of good and two kinds of evil: justice (justitia) and what is beneficial, useful, or agreeable (commodum); injustice, and what is harmful or unpleasant (incommodum). Rational beings, as well as other beings that can perceive, have a natural will for avoiding what is harmful or unpleasant (incommodum) and for possessing what is beneficial, useful, or agreeable (commodum), and by this natural will, which is for happiness, they move themselves to willing other things, such as means by which to achieve the good they will.
In contrast, rational beings can be just or unjust, and can will justice or injustice. While all rational beings will happiness, not all of them will justice. It is possible for the two wills to conflict, and for one to will happiness inordinately, and in this way desert justice. Alternately, it is possible for one to will justice, which affects how happiness is willed.
Justice, when it is added, would so temper the will for happiness, that it would both curb the will’s excess and not cut off its ability of exceeding. So, because one would will to be happy, one could go to excess [excedere], but because one would will justly, one would not will to go to excess [excedere], and so having a just will for happiness one could and should be happy. And, by not willing what one ought not will, even though one could, one would merit being able to never will what should not be willed, and by always keeping justice through a restrained [moderatam] will, one would in no way be in need; but, if one were to desert justice through an unrestrained [immoderatam] will, one would be in need in every way. (S., p. 258)
Chapters 15-16 show that the relation between justice and injustice is one of a good and its privation, or put another way, justice is something, meaning it has goodness and it has being, while injustice is nothing but the absence or privation of the justice that should exist, namely in a will. The priority of justice over injustice means that the will retains traces (vestigia) of the justice it abandoned, namely that it ought to have justice. Injustice, or the state of being unjust, does not have any being, meaning it is nothing.
The relationships between evil, injustice, nothing, and the will are explained in Chapters 7-11, 19-20, and 26. First, as the teacher explains, the will itself, considered as will is not nothing. “Now, even if [the will, and the turning of the will] are not substances, still it cannot be proven that they are not beings [essentias], for there are many beings other than those which are properly called ‘substances.’ So then, a good will is not more something than an evil will is, nor is the latter more evil than the former is good.” (S., p. 245) The conclusion of this is not that the evil will is not in fact evil, but rather that “the evil will is not that very evil that makes evil people evil.” (S., p. 245)
The evil that makes people evil is instead injustice, the privation of justice, which is nothing. Saying that injustice and evil are in fact nothing raises a problem, however, for it does seem as if injustice and evil aresomething. For one, it seems that good and evil are both correlative to each other. “[E]vil is a privation of the good, I concede, but I see that good is no less the privation of evil. (S., p. 247) Posing a second difficulty, it seems that “evil” must signify something, since “evil” is a name. Lastly, the effects of evil seem in our experience to be something, so it seems paradoxical to insist that their cause is “nothing.”
These difficulties are resolved in several ways. First, as noted earlier, the relationship between evil or injustice as a privation, and its opposite, justice, is not a reciprocal one. Injustice is the privation of justice, justice is not the privation of injustice, but that which injustice is a privation of. Put another way, justice is something positive, and has being, and its being is not dependent upon or conditioned by its opposite and privation, injustice.
A second resolution lies in noting that “nothing” does signify, but signifies by negation. As the teacher says, making an important distinction:
“[E]vil” and “nothing” do signify something; still though what they signify is not evil or nothing. But, there is another way in which they signify something and what is signified is something; not truly something, though, but as-if something [quasi aliquid]. For indeed, many things are said in accordance with the form [of language] [secundum formam], which are not said in accordance with the reality [secundum rem]. (S., p. 250)So, in this way, “evil” and “nothing” signify something, and what is signified is something not in accordance with the reality but in accordance with the form of speaking. (S., p. 251)
A third resolution resides in explaining the relationship between the evil and nothing(ness) of injustice and the seeming positivity and being of things that get called evil. The will itself, as something, is good; in-itself, willing objects of the will, from the basest pleasures to being-like God, is good. Even the base and unclean useful or pleasurable things that irrational animals take pleasure in (commoda infima et immunda quibusirrationalia animalia delectantur, S., p. 257) are in themselves good. What allows some positive existing thing to be an evil is the disorder it is involved in, and this has to do with the will, and with injustice as such, which are the source of any positivity evil has. “[S]ince no thing is called “evil” except for an evil will or on account of an evil will – like an evil man and an evil action – nothing is clearer than that no thing is evil, nor is evil anything but the absence of the justice that has been deserted in the will, or in some thing because of an evil will.” (S., p. 264)The absence of justice in the will, or injustice, is always strictly speaking nothing, the absence or lack of what ought to be. However, “sometimes the evil that is harmful or unpleasant (incommodum) is clearly nothing, like blindness, other times it is something, like sadness or pain.” (S., p. 274) What we typically focus on in thinking about evil are the latter cases. “When, then, we hear the word ‘evil,’ we do not fear the evil that is nothing, but the evil that is something, which follows from the absence of the good. For, from injustice and blindness, which are evil and which are nothing, follow many harmful or unpleasant things (incommoda) that are evil and are something, and these are what we dread when we hear the word ‘evil.’” (S., p. 274)
Accordingly, returning to the original issue, what creatures have that is good, they have from God, and what they have of evil derives from them (or from other creatures), but ultimately from nothing, that is to say, from a lack of what ought to be (or of what ought to have been). In any given case, of course, for instance the Devil’s case, it may take considerable analysis to see how what God gave permitted evil to take place.
This late work is of particular interest for several reasons. In its content, it deals with matters examined by Anselm’s previous works, developing his doctrines further. The De Concordia refers to earlier works by name, specifically De Veritate, De Libertate Arbitrii, De Casu Diaboli, and De Conceptu Virginali et de Originali Peccato. Stylistically, its form is intermediary between those of the treatises and those of the dialogues, for Anselm addresses the possible objections and responses of an interlocutor in the first book, but does so within one continuous discourse. By the second and third books, Anselm no longer addresses an interlocutor. The three main topics or “questions” of the title unevenly divide the books of the work.
The first question, or problem, is how free choice (liberum arbitrium) and God’s foreknowledge could be compatible. This is really a clash between freedom and necessity. “[I]t is necessary [necesse est] that those things that God foreknows be going to happen [esse futura], and those that come to be through free choice do not arrive through any necessity.” (S., v. 2, p. 245) Anselm’s procedure is to assume both free choice and God’s foreknowledge in order to see whether they do in fact contradict each other, reasoning that, if they are genuinely incompatible, some other impossibility will arise from them. The assumption does not in fact generate a contradiction.
[I]f something is going to happen without necessity [sine necessitate], God, who foreknows all future things foreknows this very thing. So, what God foreknows necessarily [necessitate] is going to happen, just as it is foreknown. Accordingly, it is necessary [necesse est] for something to be going to happen without necessity. Therefore, for one who rightly understands this, the foreknowledge upon which necessity follows and the free choice from which necessity is removed do not seem contradictory at all, since it is necessary that God foreknows what is going to happen, and God foreknows something to be going to happen without any necessity. (S., p. 245)
The interlocutor raises several objections. The first is easily resolved, since it consists in simply shifting the ground from actions in general to sinning. Since God foreknows whether a person will sin or not, it seems that it is then necessary that a person sins or does not sin. Anselm simply makes explicit the full significance of what is being asserted, after which it is clear that framing the issue in terms of sin simply generates the same structure. “You should not say just: ‘God foreknows that I am going to sin or I am not going to sin,’ but rather: ‘God foreknows that without necessity I am going to sin or I am not going to sin.’” (S., p. 246)
The second objection raises a puzzle that stems from the sense of “necessity.” “Necessity seems to mean [sonare] compulsion or restraint [coactionem uel prohibitionem]. So, if it is necessary that I sin from my willing, I understand myself to be compelled by some hidden force to the will to sin; and if I do not sin, I am restrained from the will to sin.” (S., p. 246-7) In response, Anselm notes that some things are said to necessarily be or not be, even when there is no compulsion or restraint. In the case of voluntary actions, God foreknows them, but this foreknowledge does not produce any compulsion or restraint. To the contrary, God foreknows them precisely as voluntary actions. There is a necessity involved, but one that “follows,” rather than “precedes,” or determines, the thing or event.
Anselm provides examples of these two modalities of necessity. An uprising that is going to take place tomorrow does not occur by necessity. It could happen otherwise, although it will not. The sun rising tomorrow will happen by necessity. It must happen that way.
The uprising, which will not be from necessity, is asserted to be going to happen only by a following necessity [sequenti necessitate], since what is going to happen is being said of what is going to happen. For, if it is going to happen tomorrow, by necessity it is going to happen. The sunrise, however, is understood to be going to happen by both kinds of necessity, namely the preceding [praecedenti] necessity that makes the thing be – so it will be, since it is necessary [necesse est] that it be – and the following necessity that does not compel it to be. (S., p. 250)
When one says that it is necessary for what God foreknows to happen, care is needed lest these different modalities of necessity get mixed up. In the case of human willing, the necessity is of the following, not the preceding kind. There is a temporality involved in the necessity of human will.
What the free will wills, the free will can and cannot not-will [non velle], and it is necessary that it will. For, it can not-will before it wills, since it is free, and once it wills, it cannot not-will, but rather it is necessary that it will, since it is impossible for it to will and not will the same thing at the same time. . . . there is a twofold necessity, because [what the will freely wills] is compelled to be by the will, and what happens cannot at the same time not happen. But the free will makes these necessities, which can avoid them [coming to be] before they are. (S., p. 251)
Far from free will being incompatible with necessity and with God’s foreknowledge, free will is in fact productive of some necessity. Anselm employs a line of reasoning similar to that used in earlier works, most notably in the De Veritate. “Why then is it something astonishing if in this way something is from freedom and from necessity, when there are many things that are grasped in opposite ways by changing the point of view [diverse ratione]?” (S., p. 253) Employing this technique of distinction allows him the conclude that they are in fact compatible: “No inconsistency arises if, in accordance with the reasons given earlier, we assert one and the same thing to be necessarily going to be, since it is going to be, and that it is by no necessity compelled to be going to be, unless by that necessity that was said earlier to come to be from free will.” (S., p. 253)
In Chapter 5, ultimately in order to be able to provide a hermeneutic for seemingly problematic Scriptural passages, Anselm provides readers with an intellectual glimpse of eternity. Within eternity, there is no past or future, but only present; not the fleeting present of our temporal experience, but an eternal present, one that has an ontological priority over time as we experience it. “Although nothing is there except what is present, it is not the temporal present, like ours, but rather the eternal, within which all times altogether are contained. If in a certain way the present time contains every place and all the things that are in any place, likewise, every time is encompassed [clauditur] in the eternal present, and everything that is in any time.” (S., p. 254)
The nature of temporal things is that, insofar as they are in time, they do not always exist, and they change from time to time, whereas, as they exist in eternity, they always exist and are unchangeable. Anselm again frames this in terms of different points of view. Something can be able to be changed in time and still be unchangeable in eternity “For things that are changeable in time and unchangeable in eternity are not more opposed than not being in some time is to always being in eternity, or having been or going to be in accordance with time and not having been or not going to be in eternity.” (S., p. 255) This allows a fuller understanding of the relation between God’s foreknowledge and free choice. Before (in the temporal sequence) something is willed by a being existing in time, such as sinning or not sinning, it can be otherwise. It already exists in eternity, however, which is how God knows (or from our point of view, foreknows) it.
Anselm deals briefly with the second question or problem, reconciling predestination with free choice. This question seems to present a more problematic issue than divine foreknowledge. One can, as Anselm does, reconcile divine foreknowledge with free human choices by taking the position that God knows the free human choices as free, but from a vantage point of eternity, in which the free, uncompelled or restrained human actions have already happened, or more properly expressed are already happening. Predestination, however, seems to involve God making things happen the way they do. There is a possible resolution, however; we can say: “God predestines evil people and their evil works when he does not correct them and their evil works. But he is said to foreknow and predestine good things, because he causes [facit] that they be and that they be good; but for evil things, he only causes them to be what they are essentially, not that they are evil.” (S., p. 261) That is, (in accordance with the positions developed in Anselm’s earlier works), God never directly causes something evil, but rather provides the basis, in being and goodness, for what is then turned to evil, turned away from how it ought to be.
God does predestine human actions, according to Anselm, but he predestines them precisely as free or voluntary actions, which does not impose a necessity upon them that does not come from the choosing person’s willing, by the sort of following necessity discussed in relation to foreknowledge.
For God – even though He predestines – does not cause [facit] these things by compelling or restraining the will, but rather by committing [dimittendo] it to its own power. But even though the will uses its own power, it does nothing that God does not do in good things by his grace, in bad things not by fault of his own will but the will of the person. . . And just as foreknowledge, which does not err, only foreknows what is true, just as it will be, whether it is necessary or spontaneous, likewise, predestination . . . predestines a thing only as it is in foreknowledge. (S., p. 261)
The third question or problem is reconciling God’s grace and human free choice. In the course of showing that there is no real contradiction between these, Anselm’s treatment ranges over a number of issues. There are a variety of different viewpoints to be considered. Some, supporting themselves by appeal to Scripture, maintain that only divine grace leads to salvation; others, likewise appealing to other Scriptural passages, maintain that salvation depends on our will. Furthering the first position, some cite passages that seem to have good works and salvation depend on grace, and others point to the common enough experience of people who, despite their efforts, fail. In addition to Scriptural passages that teach that humans have free choice, or that urge people to do good and that condemn evil, there is a line of reasoning supporting free choice, namely: “If nobody were to do good or evil through free choice, then there would be no reason why [nec ullo modo esset cur] God justly gives what they deserve [retribueret] to good people and bad people on account of the merits of each one.” (S., p. 264)
The position that Anselm develops can be summarized as the following: Grace and free choice are not only compatible, but they in fact cooperate with each other. So, setting aside the exception of baptized infants, grace and free choice are both required for one to be saved. The ways in which grace and free choice cooperate with each other, as well as the ways in which free choice fails to cooperate with grace, are complex. Four main features of this are: the relationship between uprightness or righteousness (rectitudo) and grace; the need for cooperation with grace through one’s will; Anselm’s threefold distinction about the will; and the will for happiness and the will for justice.
Uprightness of will was discussed at length in Anselm’s earlier works, but it receives a more sophisticated and nuanced treatment in the De Concordia. As before: “There is no doubt that the will only wills rightly [recte] when it is upright [recta]. . . the will is not upright because it wills rightly, but it wills rightly because it is upright.” (S., p. 265-6) When the will wills uprightness for its own sake, it quite clearly wills rightly, and as in the earlier works, the will thereby wills to remain in this uprightness. In the De Concordia treatment, however, it is possible for one to will more uprightness. “I do not deny that an upright will wills an uprightness it does not yet have, when it wills to have a greater uprightness than it has; but I say that no will can will uprightness, if it does not have the uprightness by which it wills it.” (S., p. 266)
Later, Anselm says something very similar:
It is said to those already converted [i.e. turned towards God, conservis]: “be converted,” either so that they are further converted or so that they keep themselves converted. For, those who say: “convert us, God,” are already in some way converted, since they have an upright will when they will to be converted. But they pray through what they have received so that their conversion be augmented, just like those who were believers and said: “increase our faith.” It is as if both of these groups said: “increase in us what you gave us, bring to fruition [perfice] what you began. (S., p. 272)
When one has uprightness, one can will to preserve it, but lacking it, one cannot simply will oneself to have it, and then thereby have it. In addition, a creature cannot have uprightness from itself, nor can it have it from another creature. Instead, it can only have it through God’s grace.
Grace, as Anselm states clearly, is not something simple to pin down. For one, there are many different ways in which grace is bestowed. As Anselm says, he is “not up to the task [non. . .valeam] – for it does this in many ways – of enumerating the ways in which, after this uprightness has been received, grace aids free choice to keep what it received.” (S., p. 267) For another, graces follow on graces, and this takes place in more than one way as well. For instance: “If the will, by free choice keeping what it received, merits either an augmentation of the justice it has received, or even the power for a good will, or some sort of reward, all of these are fruits of the first grace, and “grace for grace,” and therefore all of this is to be imputed to grace. . .” (S., p. 266-7)
Free choice can cooperate with grace, grace that is first given, that is to say, the giving of the uprightness that the will receives by free choice, and then, in keeping this righteousness, cooperates with grace again. The grace can only be lost by the choices made to abandon uprightness in favor of something else. Worthy of note, in this treatise, Anselm gives a concrete example of this sort of grace. “This uprightness is never separated from the will except when it wills something else that is not in harmony with this uprightness. Just as when somebody receives the uprightness of willing sobriety, and they reject it by wiling an immoderate pleasure of drinking. (S., p. 267)
In Anselm’s view, graces are offered in many ways, even at the moments when one is deciding. He give several examples of how grace assists the free choice of the will when one is tempted to abandon the uprightness one has received, “by mitigating or even entirely cancelling the force of the besieging temptation, or by augmenting the affection of that same uprightness.” (S., p. 268) Anselm supplies a principle of interpretation in these matters: “In short, since everything is subject to God’s ordination, whatever happens to a person that aids the free choice to receiving or keeping that uprightness of which I speak, is to be imputed entirely to grace.” (S., p. 268)
In his explanation of the extended metaphor of cultivation in Book 3, Chapter 6, Anselm provides further examples of grace, showing grace coming from grace and the involvement of free choice at each point. The metaphor is:
[J]ust as the earth, without any cultivation by humans, brings forth innumerable herbs and trees without which human nature is nourished or by which it is even destroyed, those that most necessary to us for nourishing life [are not brought forth] without great labor and cultivation, and not without seeds. Likewise the human hearth, without teaching, without application [studio] spontaneously germinates thoughts and willings [voluntates] that are of no use for salvation or are even harmful, whereas those, without which we make no progress to salvation of the soul, never conceive and germinate without a seed of their own sort and laborious cultivation. (S., p. 270)
Grace, the seed, involves, even requires human participation and effort, and at the same time aids the human effort at nearly every turn. Grace and human willing constantly interact.
That [preachers] are sent, is a grace. And for this reason, preaching is a grace, since what comes down from grace is grace; and hearing [the Word preached] is grace, and understanding what is heard is grace, and uprightness of wiling is grace. Truly sending, preaching, hearing, understanding are nothing unless the will wills what the mind understands. . . So, what the mind conceives from hearing the Word is the seed of preaching and uprightness is the “growth” [incrementum] that God gives, without which “neither he who plants nor he who waters is anything, but rather God who gives the growth.” (S., p. 271)
Anselm’s discussion of the will in the De Concordia revisits some of the same doctrines developed in earlier works. A person is not forced by temptation or oppression to abandon uprightness of will, but rather fails to will to keep it because he or she wills something else. What a person wills, they either will on account of uprightness or some benefit. These motives can, and in some cases do, clash with each other. There is a finer analysis of the will, one used later as the starting point in the De Moribus attributed to Anselm.
Since particular instruments have what they are [hoc quod sunt], and their aptitudes, and their uses, let us distinguish in the will that on account of which we call it an instrument, its aptitudes, and its uses. These aptitudes in the will we can call “affections,” since the instrument of willing is affected by its aptitudes.The will is spoken of equivocally, and in three ways. For, the instrument of willing is one thing, the affection of the instrument is another, and the use of this same instrument is yet another. The instrument of willing is that power [vis] of the soul that it uses for willing . . . The affection of this instrument is that by which this instrument itself is affected to willing something even when it does not think about what it wills . . . . The use of this very instrument is what we have only when we think about the thing that we will. (S., p. 280)
There is only one instrument of willing, and the instrument itself does not admit of degrees. There are many uses of the will, that is, actual willings in concrete situations, using the instrument of the will. There are multiple affections or aptitudes of the will, and they do admit of greater and lesser degrees. Anselm states that all of these can be regarded as different wills, since they are not identical (they are distinguishable without being separable). The distinction also allows clarification of the agency of the will: “The will as instrument moves all of the other instruments that we freely [sponte] use, both those that are part of us – like hand, tongue, sight – and those external to us – like pen, hatchet – and causes [facit] all of our voluntary motions. Indeed, it moves itself through its own affection, whence it can be called an instrument that moves its very self.” (S., p. 283-4)
Two affections are of particular importance, and allow clarification of how one deserts justice or uprightness of will. “From these two affections, which we still call ‘wills,’ all the merit of a person comes, whether good or bad. These two wills differ, however, because the one which is to willing benefit is inseparable, but the one for willing uprightness is separable.” (S., p. 284) This means that the will to benefit, which Anselm also calls “will to happiness” (uoluntas beatitudinis) is always part of the human being, whereas the will to justice is not. A person can will justice or uprightness (if they have it), in which case they do have it, or a person can not. It is by deserting justice, or by not willing the will to justice, in order to will something else, meaning happiness of such a sort that it is incompatible with justice, that the will as a whole, and a person as a whole goes astray. This then happens by the use of the person’s free choice.
Anselm left behind fragments of an unfinished work that is of some philosophical interest. Stylistically, they appear to have been intended to be a full dialogue, and the portions that we possess are written in polished Latin style. Their content consists in analyses of concepts and terminology central to certain parts of Anselm’s work, and although the theme of uncritical acceptance of ordinary linguistic usage obscuring the real matters at hand is not a new one, the analyses are carried out to a degree of sophistication unparalleled by the extant works. The student begins the dialogue: “There are many matters regarding which I have for some time wished your response, among which are ability [potestas] and inability [impotentia], possibility and impossibility, necessity and freedom. I enumerate all of these together at the same time, because the knowledge of them seems to me to be mixed up together.” (u.W, p. 23)
The student is led to several absurd conclusions in reasoning about these matters, which Anselm treated in earlier works, for example reconciling God being omnipotent with God being unable to do certain things, or it being impossible for God to do those things. The teacher indicates that what is needed is an understanding of the meaning of the verb “to do” (facere), and of what is, properly speaking (proprie) “one’s own” (suum alicuius). “To do” (later, Anselm will indicate that agere, “to act” does this as well) has an interesting and unique status, since it is used colloquially as substitute for many other expressions, even including those involving “not doing” (non facere). The expressions which it may substitute for can be the proper responses to the question: “what is he/she doing?”
The teacher then introduces several discussions about causes. “[E]verything of which any verb is said [i.e. any subject of which a verb is predicated], is some cause for what is signified by that verb being the case. And, every cause, in ordinary linguistic usage [usu loquendi] is said to “make” or do” [facere] what it is the cause of.” (u.W, p. 26) Some of these are straightforward, such as a person running causes that there is running. Some of these are not quite so straightforward. “For, in this way, one who sits, makes there to be sitting, and one who suffers, makes there to be suffering, because if the one who suffers were not to be, there would not be a suffering.” (u.W, p. 26) In addition, the being or nature of a thing is a cause for what can be said of it. “If, for example, we say: ‘(a) human being is an animal,’ (a) human being is a cause that there be an animal and that it be said that ‘there is animal.’ I do not mean that (a) human being is the cause for animal existing, but rather that (a) human being is the cause that it be and be called (an) animal. For by this name the entire human being is signified and conceived, in which whole animal is as a part.” (u.W, p. 27-8)
Next, the teacher notes that there are different ways (modis usus loquendi) of using the verb “to do,” “to make,” or “to cause” (facere), and although he concedes that their division is numerous and quite complicated (multiplex et nimis implicata), he advances a sixfold division of causing things to be or not to be.
Two ways, when:
- it causes what it is said to cause, or
- it does not cause what it is said to cause not to be
Four ways, when it causes or does not cause something else to be or not to be. For we say something to cause another thing to be, because. . . .
- it causes something else to be, or
- it does not cause something else to be, or
- because it causes something else not to be, or
- because it does not cause something else not to be. (u.W, p. 29)
He provides examples of each of these:
- . . . when somebody is said to cause another person to be dead by slaying him or her with a sword.
- The only example . . . I have is if I posit someone who could resuscitate a dead person, but does not will to do so. . . . In other matters, examples are abundant, as when we say that somebody causes an evil to be, one that, when he or she is able to, that somebody does not cause it not to be.
- . . . when it is asserted that someone killed another . . . because he or she ordered that the other be killed, or because he or she caused the killer to have a sword, or because he or she accused the one who was killed . . . . These people do not cause per se what is said to be caused . . . .but by doing something else . . . they act through an intermediary.
- . . .when we pronounce someone to have killed another, who did not provide arms to the one who was killed before he or she was killed, or who did not retrain the killer, or who did not do something that, had he or she done it, the person would not have been killed
- . . . by taking away the arms, one causes the one who is about to be killed to be disarmed, or by opening a door one causes the killer not to be closed up where he or she had been detained
- . . . when by not disarming the killer, one does not cause them not to be armed, or by not leading the one who would be killed away, so that they would not be in the killer’s presence. (u.W, p. 29-30)
The same six modes also hold for “to cause not to be” (facere non esse), and Anselm provides examples for them as well. In all but the first mode, the one who is supposed to cause something does not cause it directly. Likewise, the modes hold for “not to cause to be” (non facere esse) and “not to cause not to be” (non facere non esse). These tools for analysis, the teacher suggests, can be used for other verbs, for “is” (esse), and for “ought” or “owes” (debere), allowing restatement of the expressions in forms better signifying what is really meant by the expressions.
Willing, or “to will” (velle) presents an interesting set of conditions, for it parallels “to do” or “to cause.” “We say ‘to will’ in the same six modes as ‘to cause to be.’ Likewise, we say ‘to will not to be’ in all of the different ways as ‘to cause not to be.’” (u.W, p. 37) This expression can also be dealt with under a fourfold division. In the first, “efficient will” (efficiens), “we will in such a way that [ut], if we are able to, we cause to be what we will.” (u.W, p. 38) In another type of willing, “approving will” (approbans), “[w]e will something that we are able to cause to be but we do not cause to be, but still, if it happens, it pleases us, and we approve of it.” (u.W, p. 38) In yet another type of willing, “conceding will” (concedens), “we will something. . . like a creditor who, being indulgent, wills to accept from a debtor barley in place of the wheat [the debtor owes].” (u.W, p. 38) In the last kind, “someone is said to will what one neither approves nor concedes, but rather permits, when one could prohibit it.” (u.W, p. 38)
There is an order of implication to these wills as well:
[T]he one that I have called “efficient will,” when it wills, so far as it is able, it causes it, and it also approves it, concedes it, and permits it. The “approving” will does not cause what it wills, but it does approve it, concede it, and permit it. The “conceding” will does not cause or approve what it wills, unless on account of something else, but it does concede and permit it. The “permitting” will does not cause, or approve, or concede what it wills, but only permits it even though it disapproves of it. (u.W, p. 38-9)
These categories of analysis can be extended not simply to human willing, but also to the divine will, addressing some of the issues about the divine will and its compatibility with evil human or angelic acts raised and dealt with in the earlier works.
Anselm also provides further classification of causes. Some causes are efficient causes, for instance the maker of an object, or the wisdom that makes somebody wise. Other causes are not efficient causes, including the matter from which something is made, or space and time, within which spatial and temporal things (localia et temporalia) come to be. All of these are causes in some sense, since they all have some role in what is, or is not, being so.
Anselm also distinguishes between proximate, or immediate causes and distant, or mediated causes. “Proximate causes are those that by themselves (per se) cause what they are said to cause, with no other mediate cause standing in between them and the effect that they cause, and distant [longinquae] causes are those that do not by themselves (per se) cause what they are said to cause, unless there is either one or more other mediating cause(s).” (u.W, p. 40) The first two modes of “to cause” discussed earlier apply to proximate causes, the other four to distant causes. Both efficient causes and non-efficient causes can be proximate or distant causes, although, as Anselm points out, strictly speaking, distant causes are themselves proximate causes of something at least: “Although very often causes are said to causes not by themselves (per se), but by another (per aliud), i.e. by a medium – whence they can be called distant causes – still every cause has its proximate effect that it causes by itself (per se) and whose proximate cause it is.” (u.W, p. 41) All causes are involved in a linking or network of causes and effects whose ultimate origin is God. “Every cause has causes going back all the way to the supreme cause of all, God, who since He is the cause of everything that is something, does not himself have a cause. Every effect whatsoever has many causes of diverse types, except for the first effect, since the supreme cause alone created everything.” (u.W, p. 41)
Anselm also discusses the meaning of “something” (aliquid) and “ability” (potestas) in the fragments, largely reiterating points made in earlier works.
Anselm produced other works beyond those summarized and excerpted from here, including theEpistola de Incarnatione Verbi (on the Incarnation of the Word), De Conceptu Virginali et de Originali Peccato (on the Virgin Conception and Original Sin), De Processione Spiritus Sancti (on the Procession of the Holy Spirit), all of which contain some philosophical reasoning as well as theological.
The last century has seen several other Anselmian texts made available to scholars. As noted earlier, theFragments come from an unfinished work edited and established by Dom F .S. Schmitt, O.S.B. Arguably of greater significance is the De Moribus (on Human Morals), edited and established by R. W. Southern and Dom Schmitt in Memorials of St. Anselm, which discusses the affections of the will at great length, in great detail, and through the use of many illuminating metaphors (similtudines). As Southern and Dom Schmitt note, this work was added to considerably and edited by an unknown redactor, then circulated and attributed to Anselm as the De Simultudinibus. Also included in that volume are the Dicta Anselmi (Anselm’s Sayings), assembled and redacted most likely by Anselm’s companion, the monk Alexander.
In addition, Anselm left behind numerous letters, prayers, and meditations, many of very high literary and spiritual quality.
Several readily accessible research bibliographies on Anselm exist. Two particularly useful ones are:
The standard scholarly version of Anselm’s collected works is the edition by Dom F. S. Schmitt, O.S.B.S. Anselmi Cantuariensis Archiepiscopi Opera Omnia. 6 vols. (Edinburgh: Thomas Nelson and Sons. 1940-1961). It was reprinted in 1968 by F. Fromann Verlag (Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt), and is available currently on CD-ROM from Past Masters.
Additional Latin writings may be found in Memorials of St. Anselm. R. W. Southern and F. S. Schmitt, O.S.B. eds. (Oxford University Press. 1969), and in Ein neues unvollendetes Werk des heilige Anselem von Canterbury, F. S. Schmitt, O.S.B., ed. (Munster: Aschendorf. 1936)
There are numerous English translations of Anselm’s works. Below are several of the most common:
In addition to the works referenced below, the entirety of the occasional volumes comprising Analecta Anselmiana, Spicilegium Beccense, and Anselm Studies are all to be highly recommended, as is The Saint Anselm Journal, which is online and affiliated with the Institute for Saint Anselm Studies.
Marist College and ReasonIO
U. S. A.
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