The Philosophy of Anthropology refers to the central philosophical perspectives which underpin, or have underpinned, the dominant schools in anthropological thinking. It is distinct from Philosophical Anthropology which attempts to define and understand what it means to be human.
This article provides an overview of the most salient anthropological schools, the philosophies which underpin them and the philosophical debates surrounding these schools within anthropology. It specifically operates within these limits because the broader discussions surrounding the Philosophy of Science and the Philosophy of Social Science have been dealt with at length elsewhere in this encyclopedia. Moreover, the specific philosophical perspectives have also been discussed in great depth in other contributions, so they will be elucidated to the extent that this is useful to comprehending their relationship with anthropology. In examining the Philosophy of Anthropology, it is necessary to draw some, even if cautious borders, between anthropology and other disciplines. Accordingly, in drawing upon anthropological discussions, we will define, as anthropologists, scholars who identify as such and who publish in anthropological journals and the like. In addition, early anthropologists will be selected by virtue of their interest in peasant culture and non-Western, non-capitalist and stateless forms of human organization.
The article specifically aims to summarize the philosophies underpinning anthropology, focusing on the way in which anthropology has drawn upon them. The philosophies themselves have been dealt with in depth elsewhere in this encyclopedia. It has been suggested by philosophers of social science that anthropology tends to reflect, at any one time, the dominant intellectual philosophy because, unlike in the physical sciences, it is influenced by qualitative methods and so can more easily become influenced by ideology (for example Kuznar 1997 or Andreski 1974). This article begins by examining what is commonly termed ‘physical anthropology.’ This is the science-oriented form of anthropology which came to prominence in the nineteenth century. As part of this section, the article also examines early positivist social anthropology, the historical relationship between anthropology and eugenics, and the philosophy underpinning this.
The next section examines naturalistic anthropology. ‘Naturalism,’ in this usage, is drawn from the biological ‘naturalists’ who collected specimens in nature and described them in depth, in contrast to ‘experimentalists.’ Anthropological ‘naturalists’ thus conduct fieldwork with groups of people rather than engage in more experimental methods. The naturalism section looks at the philosophy underpinning the development of ethnography-focused anthropology, including cultural determinism, cultural relativism, fieldwork ethics and the many criticisms which this kind of anthropology has provoked. Differences in its development in Western and Eastern Europe also are analyzed. As part of this, the article discusses the most influential schools within naturalistic anthropology and their philosophical foundations.
The article then examines Post-Modern or ‘Contemporary’ anthropology. This school grew out of the ‘Crisis of Representation’ in anthropology beginning in the 1970s. The article looks at how the Post-Modern critique has been applied to anthropology, and it examines the philosophical assumptions behind developments such as auto-ethnography. Finally, it examines the view that there is a growing philosophical split within the discipline.
Anthropology itself began to develop as a separate discipline in the mid-nineteenth century, as Charles Darwin’s (1809-1882) Theory of Evolution by Natural Selection (Darwin 1859) became widely accepted among scientists. Early anthropologists attempted to apply evolutionary theory within the human species, focusing on physical differences between different human sub-species or racial groups (see Eriksen 2001) and the perceived intellectual differences that followed.
The philosophical assumptions of these anthropologists were, to a great extent, the same assumptions which have been argued to underpin science itself. This is the positivism, rooted in Empiricism, which argued that knowledge could only be reached through the empirical method and statements were meaningful only if they could be empirically justified, though it should be noted that Darwin should not necessarily be termed a positivist. Science needed to be solely empirical, systematic and exploratory, logical, theoretical (and thus focused on answering questions). It needed to attempt to make predictions which are open to testing and falsification and it needed to be epistemologically optimistic (assuming that the world can be understood). Equally, positivism argues that truth-statements are value-neutral, something disputed by the postmodern school. Philosophers of Science, such as Karl Popper (1902-1994) (for example Popper 1963), have also stressed that science must be self-critical, prepared to abandon long-held models as new information arises, and thus characterized by falsification rather than verification though this point was also earlier suggested by Herbert Spencer (1820-1903) (for example Spencer 1873). Nevertheless, the philosophy of early physical anthropologists included a belief in empiricism, the fundamentals of logic and epistemological optimism. This philosophy has been criticized by anthropologists such as Risjord (2007) who has argued that it is not self-aware – because values, he claims, are always involved in science – and non-neutral scholarship can be useful in science because it forces scientists to better contemplate their ideas.
During the mid-nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, anthropologists began to systematically examine the issue of racial differences, something which became even more researched after the acceptance of evolutionary theory (see Darwin 1871). That said, it should be noted that Darwin himself did not specifically advocate eugenics or theories of progress. However, even prior to Darwin’s presentation of evolution (Darwin 1859), scholars were already attempting to understand ‘races’ and the evolution of societies from ‘primitive’ to complex (for example Tylor 1865).
Early anthropologists such as Englishman John Beddoe (1826-1911) (Boddoe 1862) or Frenchman Arthur de Gobineau (1816-1882) (Gobineau 1915) developed and systematized racial taxonomies which divided, for example, between ‘black,’ ‘yellow’ and ‘white.’ For these anthropologists, societies were reflections of their racial inheritance; a viewpoint termed biological determinism. The concept of ‘race’ has been criticized, within anthropology, variously, as being simplistic and as not being a predictive (and thus not a scientific) category (for example Montagu 1945) and there was already some criticism of the scope of its predictive validity in the mid-nineteenth century (for example Pike 1869). The concept has also been criticized on ethical grounds, because racial analysis is seen to promote racial violence and discrimination and uphold a certain hierarchy, and some have suggested its rejection because of its connotations with such regimes as National Socialism or Apartheid, meaning that it is not a neutral category (for example Wilson 2002, 229).
Those anthropologists who continue to employ the category have argued that ‘race’ is predictive in terms of life history, only involves the same inherent problems as any cautiously essentialist taxonomy and that moral arguments are irrelevant to the scientific usefulness of a category of apprehension (for example Pearson 1991) but, to a great extent, current anthropologists reject racial categorization. The American Anthropological Association’s (1998) ‘Statement on Race’ began by asserting that: ‘”Race” thus evolved as a worldview, a body of prejudgments that distorts our ideas about human differences and group behavior. Racial beliefs constitute myths about the diversity in the human species and about the abilities and behavior of people homogenized into “racial” categories.’ In addition, a 1985 survey by the American Anthropological Association found that only a third of cultural anthropologists (but 59 percent of physical anthropologists) regarded ‘race’ as a meaningful category (Lynn 2006, 15). Accordingly, there is general agreement amongst anthropologists that the idea, promoted by anthropologists such as Beddoe, that there is a racial hierarchy, with the white race as superior to others, involves importing the old ‘Great Chain of Being’ (see Lovejoy 1936) into scientific analysis and should be rejected as unscientific, as should ‘race’ itself. In terms of philosophy, some aspects of nineteenth century racial anthropology might be seen to reflect the theories of progress that developed in the nineteenth century, such as those of G. W. F. Hegel (1770-1831) (see below). In addition, though we will argue that Herderian nationalism is more influential in Eastern Europe, we should not regard it as having no influence at all in British anthropology. Native peasant culture, the staple of the Eastern European, Romantic nationalism-influenced school (as we will see), was studied in nineteenth century Britain, especially in Scotland and Wales, though it was specifically classified as ‘folklore’ and as outside anthropology (see Rogan 2012). However, as we will discuss, the influence is stronger in Eastern Europe.
The interest in race in anthropology developed alongside a broader interest in heredity and eugenics. Influenced by positivism, scholars such as Herbert Spencer (1873) applied evolutionary theory as a means of understanding differences between different societies. Spencer was also seemingly influenced, on some level, by theories of progress of the kind advocated by Hegel and even found in Christian theology. For him, evolution logically led to eugenics. Spencer argued that evolution involved a progression through stages of ever increasing complexity – from lower forms to higher forms – to an end-point at which humanity was highly advanced and was in a state of equilibrium with nature. For this perfected humanity to be reached, humans needed to engage in self-improvement through selective breeding.
American anthropologist Madison Grant (1865-1937) (Grant 1916), for example, reflected a significant anthropological view in 1916 when he argued that humans, and therefore human societies, were essentially reflections of their biological inheritance and that environmental differences had almost no impact on societal differences. Grant, as with other influential anthropologists of the time, advocated a program of eugenics in order to improve the human stock. According to this program, efforts would be made to encourage breeding among the supposedly superior races and social classes and to discourage it amongst the inferior races and classes (see also Galton 1909). This form of anthropology has been criticized for having a motivation other than the pursuit of truth, which has been argued to be the only appropriate motivation for any scientist. It has also been criticized for basing its arguments on disputed system of categories – race – and for uncritically holding certain assumptions about what is good for humanity (for example Kuznar 1997, 101-109). It should be emphasized that though eugenics was widely accepted among anthropologists in the nineteenth century, there were also those who criticized it and its assumptions (for example Boas 1907. See Stocking 1991 for a detailed discussion). Proponents have countered that a scientist’s motivations are irrelevant as long as his or her research is scientific, that race should not be a controversial category from a philosophical perspective and that it is for the good of science itself that the more scientifically-minded are encouraged to breed (for example Cattell 1972). As noted, some scholars stress the utility of ideologically-based scholarship.
A further criticism of eugenics is that it fails to recognize the supposed inherent worth of all individual humans (for example Pichot 2009). Advocates of eugenics, such as Grant (1916), dismiss this as a ‘sentimental’ dogma which fails to accept that humans are animals, as acceptance of evolutionary theory, it is argued, obliges people to accept, and which would lead to the decline of civilization and science itself. We will note possible problems with this perspective in our discussion of ethics. Also, it might be useful to mention that the form of anthropology that is sympathetic to eugenics is today centered around an academic journal called The Mankind Quarterly, which critics regard as ‘racist’ (for example Tucker 2002, 2) and even academically biased (for example Ehrenfels 1962). Although ostensibly an anthropology journal, it also publishes psychological research. A prominent example of such an anthropologist is Roger Pearson (b. 1927), the journal’s current editor. But such a perspective is highly marginal in current anthropology.
Also from the middle of the nineteenth century, there developed a school in Western European and North American anthropology which focused less on race and eugenics and more on answering questions relating to human institutions, and how they evolved, such as ‘How did religion develop?’ or ‘How did marriage develop?’ This school was known as ‘cultural evolutionism.’ Members of this school, such as Sir James Frazer (1854-1941) (Frazer 1922), were influenced by the positivist view that science was the best model for answering questions about social life. They also shared with other evolutionists an acceptance of a modal human nature which reflected evolution to a specific environment. However, some, such as E. B. Tylor (1832-1917) (Tylor 1871), argued that human nature was the same everywhere, moving away from the focus on human intellectual differences according to race. The early evolutionists believed that as surviving ‘primitive’ social organizations, within European Empires for example, were examples of the ‘primitive Man,’ the nature of humanity, and the origins of its institutions, could be best understood through analysis of these various social groups and their relationship with more ‘civilized’ societies (see Gellner 1995, Ch. 2).
As with the biological naturalists, scholars such as Frazer and Tylor collected specimens on these groups – in the form of missionary descriptions of ‘tribal life’ or descriptions of ‘tribal life’ by Westernized tribal members – and compared them to accounts of more advanced cultures in order to answer discrete questions. Using this method of accruing sources, now termed ‘armchair anthropology’ by its critics, the early evolutionists attempted to answered discrete questions about the origins and evolution of societal institutions. As early sociologist Emile Durkheim (1858-1917) (Durkheim 1965) summarized it, such scholars aimed to discover ‘social facts.’ For example, Frazer concluded, based on sources, that societies evolved from being dominated by a belief in Magic, to a belief in Spirits and then a belief in gods and ultimately one God. For Tylor, religion began with ‘animism’ and evolved into more complex forms but tribal animism was the essence of religion and it had developed in order to aid human survival.
This school of anthropology has been criticized because of its perceived inclination towards reductionism (such as defining ‘religion’ purely as ‘survival’), its speculative nature and its failure to appreciate the problems inherent in relying on sources, such as ‘gate keepers’ who will present their group in the light in which they want it to be seen. Defenders have countered that without attempting to understand the evolution of societies, social anthropology has no scientific aim and can turn into a political project or simply description of perceived oddities (for example Hallpike 1986, 13). Moreover, the kind of stage theories advocated by Tylor have been criticized for conflating evolution with historicist theories of progress, by arguing that societies always pass through certain phases of belief and the Western civilization is the pinnacle of development, a belief known as unilinealism. This latter point has been criticized as ethnocentric (for example Eriksen 2001) and reflects some of the thinking of Herbert Spencer, who was influential in early British anthropology.
Whereas Western European and North American anthropology were oriented towards studying the peoples within the Empires run by the Western powers and was influenced by Darwinian science, Eastern European anthropology developed among nascent Eastern European nations. This form of anthropology was strongly influenced by Herderian nationalism and ultimately by Hegelian political philosophy and the Romantic Movement of eighteenth century philosopher Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712-1778). Eastern European anthropologists believed, following the Romantic Movement, that industrial or bourgeois society was corrupt and sterile. The truly noble life was found in the simplicity and naturalness of communities close to nature. The most natural form of community was a nation of people, bonded together by shared history, blood and customs, and the most authentic form of such a nation’s lifestyle was to be found amongst its peasants. Accordingly, Eastern European anthropology elevated peasant life as the most natural form of life, a form of life that should, on some level, be strived towards in developing the new ‘nation’ (see Gellner 1995).
Eastern European anthropologists, many of them motivated by Romantic nationalism, focused on studying their own nations’ peasant culture and folklore in order to preserve it and because the nation was regarded as unique and studying its most authentic manifestation was therefore seen as a good in itself. As such, Eastern European anthropologists engaged in fieldwork amongst the peasants, observing and documenting their lives. There is a degree to which the kind of anthropology – or ‘ethnology’ – remains more popular in Eastern than in Western Europe (see, for example, Ciubrinskas 2007 or SarkanyND) at the time of writing.
Siikala (2006) observes that Finnish anthropology is now moving towards the Western model of fieldwork abroad but as recently as the 1970s was still predominantly the study of folklore and peasant culture. Baranski (2009) notes that in Poland, Polish anthropologists who wish to study international topics still tend to go to the international centers while those who remain in Poland tend to focus on Polish folk culture, though the situation is slowly changing. Lithuanian anthropologist Vytis Ciubrinkas (2007) notes that throughout Eastern Europe, there is very little separate ‘anthropology,’ with the focus being ‘national ethnology’ and ‘folklore studies,’ almost always published in the vernacular. But, again, he observes that the kind of anthropology popular in Western Europe is making inroads into Eastern Europe. In Russia, national ethnology and peasant culture also tends to be predominant (for example Baiburin 2005). Indeed, even beyond Eastern Europe, it was noted in the year 2000 that ‘the emphasis of Indian social anthropologists remains largely on Indian tribes and peasants. But the irony is that barring the detailed tribal monographs prepared by the British colonial officers and others (. . .) before Independence, we do not have any recent good ethnographies of a comparable type’ (Srivastava 2000). By contrast, Japanese social anthropology has traditionally been in the Western model, studying cultures more ‘primitive’ than its own (such as Chinese communities), at least in the nineteenth century. Only later did it start to focus more on Japanese folk culture and it is now moving back towards a Western model (see Sedgwick 2006, 67).
The Eastern school has been criticized for uncritically placing a set of dogmas – specifically nationalism – above the pursuit of truth, accepting a form of historicism with regard to the unfolding of the nation’s history and drawing a sharp, essentialist line around the nationalist period of history (for example Popper 1957). Its anthropological method has been criticized because, it is suggested, Eastern European anthropologists suffer from home blindness. By virtue of having been raised in the culture which they are studying, they cannot see it objectively and penetrate to its ontological presuppositions (for example Kapferer 2001).
The Ethnographic school, which has since come to characterize social and cultural anthropology, was developed by Polish anthropologist Bronislaw Malinowski (1884-1942) (for example Malinowski 1922). Originally trained in Poland, Malinowski’s anthropological philosophy brought together key aspects of the Eastern and Western schools. He argued that, as with the Western European school, anthropologists should study foreign societies. This avoided home blindness and allowed them to better perceive these societies objectively. However, as with the Eastern European School, he argued that anthropologists should observe these societies in person, something termed ‘participant observation’ or ‘ethnography.’ This method, he argued, solved many of the problems inherent in armchair anthropology.
It is this method which anthropologists generally summarize as ‘naturalism’ in contrast to the ‘positivism,’ usually followed alongside a quantitative method, of evolutionary anthropologists. Naturalist anthropologists argue that their method is ‘scientific’ in the sense that it is based on empirical observation but they argue that some kinds of information cannot be obtained in laboratory conditions or through questionnaires, both of which lend themselves to quantitative, strictly scientific analysis. Human culturally-influenced actions differ from the subjects of physical science because they involve meaning within a system and meaning can only be discerned after long-term immersion in the culture in question. Naturalists therefore argue that a useful way to find out information about and understand a people – such as a tribe – is to live with them, observe their lives, gain their trust and eventually live, and even think, as they do. This latter aim, specifically highlighted by Malinowski, has been termed the empathetic perspective and is considered, by many naturalist anthropologists, to be a crucial sign of research that is anthropological. In addition to these ideas, the naturalist perspective draws upon aspects of the Romantic Movement in that it stresses, and elevates, the importance of ‘gaining empathy’ and respecting the group it is studying, some naturalists argue that there are ‘ways of knowing’ other than science (for example Rees 2010) and that respect for the group can be more important than gaining new knowledge. They also argue that human societies are so complex that they cannot simply be reduced to biological explanations.
In many ways, the successor to Malinowski as the most influential cultural anthropologist was the American Clifford Geertz (1926-2006). Where Malinowski emphasized ‘participant observation’ – and thus, to a greater degree, an outsider perspective – it was Geertz who argued that the successful anthropologist reaches a point where he sees things from the perspective of the native. The anthropologist should bring alive the native point of view, which Roth (1989) notes ‘privileges’ the native, thus challenging a hierarchical relationship between the observed and the observer. He thus strongly rejected a distinction which Malinowski is merely critical of: the distinction between a ‘primitive’ and ‘civilized’ culture. In many respects, this distinction was also criticised by the Structuralists – whose central figure, Claude Levi-Strauss (1908-2009), was an earlier generation than Geertz – as they argued that all human minds involved similar binary structures (see below).
However, there was a degree to which both Malinowski and Geertz did not divorce ‘culture’ from ‘biology.’ Malinowski (1922) argued that anthropological interpretations should ultimately be reducible to human instincts while Geertz (1973, 46-48) argued that culture can be reduced to biology and that culture also influences biology, though he felt that the main aim of the ethnographer was to interpret. Accordingly, it is not for the anthropologist to comment on the culture in terms of its success or the validity of its beliefs. The anthropologist’s purpose is merely to record and interpret.
The majority of those who practice this form of anthropology are interpretivists. They argue that the aim of anthropology is to understand the norms, values, symbols and processes of a society and, in particular, their ‘meaning’ – how they fit together. This lends itself to the more subjective methods of participant observation. Applying a positivist methodology to studying social groups is regarded as dangerous because scientific understanding is argued to lead to better controlling the world and, in this case, controlling people. Interpretivist anthropology has been criticized, variously, as being indebted to imperialism (see below) and as too subjective and unscientific, because, unless there is a common set of analytical standards (such as an acceptance of the scientific method, at least to some extent), there is no reason to accept one subjective interpretation over another. This criticism has, in particular, been leveled against naturalists who accept cultural relativism (see below).
Also, many naturalist anthropologists emphasize the separateness of ‘culture’ from ‘biology,’ arguing that culture cannot simply be traced back to biology but rather is, to a great extent, independent of it; a separate category. For example, Risjord (2000) argues that anthropology ‘will never reach the social reality at which it aims’ precisely because ‘culture’ cannot simply be reduced to a series of scientific explanations. But it has been argued that if the findings of naturalist anthropology are not ultimately consilient with science then they are not useful to people outside of naturalist anthropology and that naturalist anthropology draws too stark a line between apes and humans when it claims that human societies are too complex to be reduced to biology or that culture is not closely reflective of biology (Wilson 1998, Ch. 1). In this regard, Bidney (1953, 65) argues that, ‘Theories of culture must explain the origins of culture and its intrinsic relations to the psychobiological nature of man’ as to fail to do so simply leaves the origin of culture as a ‘mystery or an accident of time.’
From the 1970s, the various leading anthropological associations began to develop codes of ethics. This was, at least in part, inspired by the perceived collaboration of anthropologists with the US-led counterinsurgency groups in South American states. For example, in the 1960s, Project Camelot commissioned anthropologists to look into the causes of insurgency and revolution in South American States, with a view to confronting these perceived problems. It was also inspired by the way that increasing numbers of anthropologists were employed outside of universities, in the private sector (see Sluka 2007).
The leading anthropological bodies – such as the Royal Anthropological Institute – hold to a system of research ethics which anthropologists, conducting fieldwork, are expected, though not obliged, to adhere to. For example, the most recent American Anthropological Association Code of Ethics (1998) emphasizes that certain ethical obligations can supersede the goal of seeking new knowledge. Anthropologists, for example, may not publish research which may harm the ‘safety,’ ‘privacy’ or ‘dignity’ of those whom they study, they must explain their fieldwork to their subjects and emphasise that attempts at anonymity may sometimes fail, they should find ways of reciprocating to those whom they study and they should preserve opportunities for future fieldworkers.
Though the American Anthropological Association does not make their philosophy explicit, much of the philosophy appears to be underpinned by the golden rule. One should treat others as one would wish to be treated oneself. In this regard, one would not wish to be exploited, misled or have ones safety or privacy comprised. For some scientists, the problem with such a philosophy is that, from their perspective, humans should be an objective object of study like any other. The assertion that the ‘dignity’ of the individual should be preserved may be seen to reflect a humanist belief in the inherent worth of each human being. Humanism has been accused of being sentimental and of failing to appreciate the substantial differences between human beings intellectually, with some anthropologists even questioning the usefulness of the broad category ‘human’ (for example Grant 1916). It has also been accused of failing to appreciate that, from a scientific perspective, humans are a highly evolved form of ape and scholars who study them should attempt to think, as Wilson (1975, 575) argues, as if they are alien zoologists. Equally, it has been asked why primary ethical responsibility should be to those studied. Why should it not be to the public or the funding body? (see Sluka 2007) In this regard, it might be suggested that the code reflects the lauding of members of (often non-Western) cultures which might ultimately be traced back to the Romantic Movement. Their rights are more important than those of the funders, the public or of other anthropologists.
Equally, the code has been criticized in terms of power dynamics, with critics arguing that the anthropologist is usually in a dominant position over those being studied which renders questionable the whole idea of ‘informed consent’ (Bourgois 2007). Indeed, it has been argued that the most recent American Anthropological Association Code of Ethics (1998) is a movement to the right, in political terms, because it accepts, explicitly, that responsibility should also be to the public and to funding bodies and is less censorious than previous codes with regard to covert research (Pels 1999). This seems to be a movement towards a situation where a commitment to the group being studied is less important than the pursuit of truth, though the commitment to the subject of study is still clear.
Likewise, the most recent set of ethical guidelines from the Association of Anthropologists of the UK and the Commonwealth implicitly accepts that there is a difference of opinion among anthropologists regarding whom they are obliged to. It asserts, ‘Most anthropologists would maintain that their paramount obligation is to their research participants . . .’ This document specifically warrants against giving subjects ‘self-knowledge which they did not seek or want.’ This may be seen to reflect a belief in a form of cultural relativism. Permitting people to preserve their way of thinking is more important than their knowing what a scientist would regard as the truth. Their way of thinking – a part of their culture – should be respected, because it is theirs, even if it is inaccurate. This could conceivably prevent anthropologists from publishing dissections of particular cultures if they might be read by members of that culture (see Dutton 2009, Ch. 2). Thus, philosophically, the debate in fieldwork ethics ranges from a form of consequentialism to, in the form of humanism, a deontological form of ethics. However, it should be emphasized that the standard fieldwork ethics noted are very widely accepted amongst anthropologists, particularly with regard to informed consent. Thus, the idea of experimenting on unwilling or unknowing humans is strongly rejected, which might be interpreted to imply some belief in human separateness.
As already discussed, Western European anthropology, around the time of World War I, was influenced by eugenics and biological determinism. But as early as the 1880s, this was beginning to be questioned by German-American anthropologist Franz Boas (1858-1942) (for example Boas 1907), based at Columbia University in New York. He was critical of biological determinism and argued for the importance of environmental influence on individual personality and thus modal national personality in a way of thinking called ‘historical particularism.’
Boas emphasized the importance of environment and history in shaping different cultures, arguing that all humans were biologically relatively similar and rejecting distinctions of ‘primitive’ and civilized.’ Boas also presented critiques of the work of early evolutionists, such as Tylor, demonstrating that not all societies passed through the phases he suggested or did not do so in the order he suggested. Boas used these findings to stress the importance of understanding societies individually in terms of their history and culture (for example Freeman 1983).
Boas sent his student Margaret Mead (1901-1978) to American Samoa to study the people there with the aim of proving that they were a ‘negative instance’ in terms of violence and teenage angst. If this could be proven, it would undermine biological determinism and demonstrate that people were in fact culturally determined and that biology had very little influence on personality, something argued by John Locke (1632-1704) and his concept of the tabula rasa. This would in turn mean that Western people’s supposed teenage angst could be changed through changing the culture. After six months in American Samoa, Mead returned to the USA and published, in 1928, her influential book Coming of Age in Samoa: A Psychological Study of Primitive Youth for Western Civilization (Mead 1928). It portrayed Samoa as a society of sexual liberty in which there were none of the problems associated with puberty that were associated with Western civilization. Accordingly, Mead argued that she had found a negative instance and that humans were overwhelming culturally determined. At around the same time Ruth Benedict (1887-1948), also a student of Boas’s, published her research in which she argued that individuals simply reflected the ‘culture’ in which they were raised (Benedict 1934).
The cultural determinism advocated by Boas, Benedict and especially Mead became very popular and developed into school which has been termed ‘Multiculturalism’ (Gottfried 2004). This school can be compared to Romantic nationalism in the sense that it regards all cultures as unique developments which should be preserved and thus advocates a form of ‘cultural relativism’ in which cultures cannot be judged by the standards of other cultures and can only be comprehended in their own terms. However, it should be noted that ‘cultural relativism’ is sometimes used to refer to the way in which the parts of a whole form a kind of separate organism, though this is usually referred to as ‘Functionalism.’ In addition, Harris (see Headland, Pike, and Harris 1990) distinguishes between ‘emic’ (insider) and ‘etic’ (outsider) understanding of a social group, arguing that both perspectives seem to make sense from the different viewpoints. This might also be understood as cultural relativism and perhaps raises the question of whether the two worlds can so easily be separated. Cultural relativism also argues, as with Romantic Nationalism, that so-called developed cultures can learn a great deal from that which they might regard as ‘primitive’ cultures. Moreover, humans are regarded as, in essence, products of culture and as extremely similar in terms of biology.
Cultural Relativism led to so-called ‘cultural anthropologists’ focusing on the symbols within a culture rather than comparing the different structures and functions of different social groups, as occurred in ‘social anthropology’ (see below). As comparison was frowned upon, as each culture was regarded as unique, anthropology in the tradition of Mead tended to focus on descriptions of a group’s way of life. Thick description is a trait of ethnography more broadly but it is especially salient amongst anthropologists who believe that cultures can only be understood in their own terms. Such a philosophy has been criticized for turning anthropology into little more than academic-sounding travel writing because it renders it highly personal and lacking in comparative analysis (see Sandall 2001, Ch. 1).
Cultural relativism has also been criticized as philosophically impractical and, ultimately, epistemologically pessimistic (Scruton 2000), because it means that nothing can be compared to anything else or even assessed through the medium of a foreign language’s categories. In implicitly defending cultural relativism, anthropologists have cautioned against assuming that some cultures are more ‘rational’ than others. Hollis (1967), for example, argues that anthropology demonstrates that superficially irrational actions may become ‘rational’ once the ethnographer understands the ‘culture.’ Risjord (2000) makes a similar point. This implies that the cultures are separate worlds, ‘rational’ in themselves. Others have suggested that entering the field assuming that the Western, ‘rational’ way of thinking is correct can lead to biased fieldwork interpretation (for example Rees 2010).
Critics have argued that certain forms of behaviour can be regarded as undesirable in all cultures, yet are only prevalent in some. It has also been argued that Multiculturalism is a form of Neo-Marxism on the grounds that it assumes imperialism and Western civilization to be inherently problematic but also because it lauds the materially unsuccessful. Whereas Marxism extols the values and lifestyle of the worker, and critiques that of the wealthy, Multiculturalism promotes “materially unsuccessful” cultures and critiques more materially successful, Western cultures (for example Ellis 2004 or Gottfried 2004).
Cultural determinism has been criticized both from within and from outside anthropology. From within anthropology, New Zealand anthropologist Derek Freeman (1916-2001), having been heavily influenced by Margaret Mead, conducted his own fieldwork in Samoa around twenty years after she did and then in subsequent fieldwork visits. As he stayed there far longer than Mead, Freeman was accepted to a greater extent and given an honorary chiefly title. This allowed him considerable access to Samoan life. Eventually, in 1983 (after Mead’s death) he published his refutation: Margaret Mead and Samoa: The Making and Unmaking of an Anthropological Myth (Freeman 1983). In it, he argued that Mead was completely mistaken. Samoa was sexually puritanical, violent and teenagers experienced just as much angst as they did everywhere else. In addition, he highlighted serious faults with her fieldwork: her sample was very small, she chose to live at the American naval base rather than with a Samoan family, she did not speak Samoan well, she focused mainly on teenage girls and Freeman even tracked one down who, as an elderly lady, admitted she and her friends had deliberately lied to Mead about their sex lives for their own amusement (Freeman 1999). It should be emphasized that Freeman’s critique of Mead related to her failure to conduct participant observation fieldwork properly (in line with Malinowski’s recommendations). In that Freeman rejects distinctions of primitive and advanced, and stresses the importance of culture in understanding human differences, it is also in the tradition of Boas. However, it should be noted that Freeman’s (1983) critique of Mead has also been criticized as being unnecessarily cutting, prosecuting a case against Mead to the point of bias against her and ignoring points which Mead got right (Schankman 2009, 17).
There remains an ongoing debate about the extent to which culture reflects biology or is on a biological leash. However, a growing body of research in genetics is indicating that human personality is heavily influenced by genetic factors (for example Alarcon, Foulks, and Vakkur 1998 or Wilson 1998), though some research also indicates that environment, especially while a fetus, can alter the expression of genes (see Nettle 2007). This has become part of the critique of cultural determinism from evolutionary anthropologists.
Between the 1930s and 1970s, various forms of functionalism were influential in British social anthropology. These schools accepted, to varying degrees, the cultural determinist belief that ‘culture’ was a separate sphere from biology and operated according to its own rules but they also argued that social institutions could be compared in order to better discern the rules of such institutions. They attempted to discern and describe how cultures operated and how the different parts of a culture functioned within the whole. Perceiving societies as organisms has been traced back to Herbert Spencer. Indeed, there is a degree to which Durkheim (1965) attempted to understand, for example, the function of religion in society. But functionalism seemingly reflected aspects of positivism: the search for, in this case, social facts (cross-culturally true), based on empirical evidence.
E. E. Evans-Pritchard (1902-1973) was a leading British functionalist from the 1930s onwards. Rejecting grand theories of religion, he argued that a tribe’s religion could only make sense in terms of function within society and therefore a detailed understanding of the tribe’s history and context was necessary. British functionalism, in this respect, was influenced by the linguistic theories of Swiss thinker Ferdinand de Saussure (1857-1913), who suggested that signs only made sense within a system of signs. He also engaged in lengthy fieldwork. This school developed into ‘structural functionalism.’ A. R. Radcliffe-Brown (1881-1955) is often argued to be a structural functionalist, though he denied this. Radcliffe-Brown rejected Malinowski’s functionalism – which argued that social practices were grounded in human instincts. Instead, he was influenced by the process philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead (1861-1947). Radcliffe-Brown claimed that the units of anthropology were processes of human life and interaction. They are in constant flux and so anthropology must explain social stability. He argued that practices, in order to survive, must adapt to other practices, something called ‘co-adaptation’ (Radcliffe-Brown 1957). It might be argued that this leads us asking where any of the practices came from in the first place.
However, a leading member of the structural functionalist school was Scottish anthropologist Victor Turner (1920-1983). Structural functionalists attempted to understand society as a structure with inter-related parts. In attempting to understand Rites of Passage, Turner argued that everyday structured society could be contrasted with the Rite of Passage (Turner 1969). This was a liminal (transitional) phase which involved communitas (a relative breakdown of structure). Another prominent anthropologist in this field was Mary Douglas (1921-2007). She examined the contrast between the ‘sacred’ and ‘profane’ in terms of categories of ‘purity’ and ‘impurity’ (Douglas 1966). She also suggested a model – the Grid/Group Model – through which the structures of different cultures could be categorized (Douglas 1970). Philosophically, this school accepted many of the assumptions of naturalism but it held to aspects of positivism in that it aimed to answer discrete questions, using the ethnographic method. It has been criticized, as we will see below, by postmodern anthropologists and also for its failure to attempt consilience with science.
Turner, Douglas and other anthropologists in this school, followed Malinowski by using categories drawn from the study of ‘tribal’ cultures – such as Rites of Passage, Shaman and Totem – to better comprehend advanced societies such as that of Britain. For example, Turner was highly influential in pursuing the Anthropology of Religion in which he used tribal categories as a means of comprehending aspects of the Catholic Church, such as modern-day pilgrimage (Turner and Turner 1978). This research also involved using the participant observation method. Critics, such as Romanian anthropologist Mircea Eliade (1907-1986) (for example Eliade 2004), have insisted that categories such as ‘shaman’ only make sense within their specific cultural context. Other critics have argued that such scholarship attempts to reduce all societies to the level of the local community despite there being many important differences and fails to take into account considerable differences in societal complexity (for example Sandall 2001, Ch. 1). Nevertheless, there is a growing movement within anthropology towards examining various aspects of human life through the so-called tribal prism and, more broadly, through the cultural one. Mary Douglas, for example, has looked at business life anthropologically while others have focused on politics, medicine or education. This has been termed ‘traditional empiricism’ by critics in contemporary anthropology (for example Davies 2010).
In France, in particular, the most prominent school, during this period, was known as Structuralism. Unlike British Functionalism, structuralism was influenced by Hegelian idealism. Most associated with Claude Levi-Strauss, structuralism argued that all cultures follow the Hegelian dialectic. The human mind has a universal structure and a kind of a priori category system of opposites, a point which Hollis argues can be used as a starting point for any comparative cultural analysis. Cultures can be broken up into components – such as ‘Mythology’ or ‘Ritual’ – which evolve according to the dialectical process, leading to cultural differences. As such, the deep structures, or grammar, of each culture can be traced back to a shared starting point (and in a sense, the shared human mind) just as one can with a language. But each culture has a grammar and this allows them to be compared and permits insights to be made about them (see, for example, Levi-Strauss 1978). It might be suggested that the same criticisms that have been leveled against the Hegelian dialectic might be leveled against structuralism, such as it being based around a dogma. It has also been argued that category systems vary considerably between cultures (see Diamond 1974). Even supporters of Levi-Strauss have conceded that his works are opaque and verbose (for example Leach 1974).
The ‘postmodern’ thinking of scholars such as Jacques Derrida (1930-2004) and Michel Foucault (1926-1984) began to become influential in anthropology in the 1970s and have been termed anthropology’s ‘Crisis of Representation.’ During this crisis, which many anthropologists regard as ongoing, every aspect of ‘traditional empirical anthropology’ came to be questioned.
Hymes (1974) criticized anthropologists for imposing ‘Western categories’ – such as Western measurement – on those they study, arguing that this is a form of domination and was immoral, insisting that truth statements were always subjective and carried cultural values. Talal Asad (1971) criticized field-work based anthropology for ultimately being indebted to colonialism and suggested that anthropology has essentially been a project to enforce colonialism. Geertzian anthropology was criticized because it involved representing a culture, something which inherently involved imposing Western categories upon it through producing texts. Marcus argued that anthropology was ultimately composed of ‘texts’ – ethnographies – which can be deconstructed to reveal power dynamics, normally the dominant-culture anthropologist making sense of the oppressed object of study through means of his or her subjective cultural categories and presenting it to his or her culture (for example Marcus and Cushman 1982). By extension, as all texts – including scientific texts – could be deconstructed, they argued, that they can make no objective assertions. Roth (1989) specifically criticizes seeing anthropology as ‘texts’ arguing that it does not undermine the empirical validity of the observations involved or help to find the power structures.
Various anthropologists, such as Roy Wagner (b. 1938) (Wagner 1981), argued that anthropologists were simply products of Western culture and they could only ever hope to understand another culture through their own. There was no objective truth beyond culture, simply different cultures with some, scientific ones, happening to be dominant for various historical reasons. Thus, this school strongly advocated cultural relativism. Critics have countered that, after Malinowski, anthropologists, with their participant observation breaking down the color bar, were in fact an irritation to colonial authorities (for example Kuper 1973) and have criticized cultural relativism, as discussed.
This situation led to what has been called the ‘reflexive turn’ in cultural anthropology. As Western anthropologists were products of their culture, just as those whom they studied were, and as the anthropologist was himself fallible, there developed an increasing movement towards ‘auto-ethnography’ in which the anthropologist analyzed their own emotions and feelings towards their fieldwork. The essential argument for anthropologists engaging in detailed analysis of their own emotions, sometimes known as the reflexive turn, is anthropologist Charlotte Davies’ (1999, 6) argument that the ‘purpose of research is to mediate between different constructions of reality, and doing research means increasing understanding of these varying constructs, among which is included the anthropologist’s own constructions’ (see Curran 2010, 109). But implicit in Davies’ argument is that there is no such thing as objective reality and objective truth; there are simply different constructions of reality, as Wagner (1981) also argues. It has also been argued that autoethnography is ‘emancipatory’ because it turns anthropology into a dialogue rather than a traditional hierarchical analysis (Heaton-Shreshta 2010, 49). Auto-ethnography has been criticized as self-indulgent and based on problematic assumptions such as cultural relativism and the belief that morality is the most important dimension to scholarship (for example Gellner 1992). In addition, the same criticisms that have been leveled against postmodernism more broadly have been leveled against postmodern anthropology, including criticism of a sometimes verbose and emotive style and the belief that it is epistemologically pessimistic and therefore leads to a Void (for example Scruton 2000). However, cautious defenders insist on the importance of being at least ‘psychologically aware’ (for example Emmett 1976) before conducting fieldwork, a point also argued by Popper (1963) with regard to conducting any scientific research. And Berger (2010) argues that auto-ethnography can be useful to the extent that it elucidates how a ‘social fact’ was uncovered by the anthropologist.
One of the significant results of the ‘Crisis of Representation’ has been a cooling towards the concept of ‘culture’ (and indeed ‘culture shock’) which was previously central to ‘cultural anthropology’ (see Oberg 1960 or Dutton 2012). ‘Culture’ has been criticized as old-fashioned, boring, problematic because it possesses a history (Rees 2010), associated with racism because it has come to replace ‘race’ in far right politics (Wilson 2002, 229), problematic because it imposes (imperialistically) a Western category on other cultures, vague and difficult to perfectly define (Rees 2010), helping to maintain a hierarchy of cultures (Abu Lughod 1991) and increasingly questioned by globalization and the breakdown of discrete cultures (for example Eriksen 2002 or Rees 2010). Defenders of culture have countered that many of these criticisms can be leveled against any category of apprehension and that the term is not synonymous with ‘nation’ so can be employed even if nations become less relevant (for example Fox and King 2002). Equally, ‘culture shock,’ formerly used to describe a rite of passage amongst anthropologists engaging in fieldwork, has been criticized because of its association with culture and also as old-fashioned (Crapanzano 2010).
In addition, a number of further movements have been provoked by the postmodern movement in anthropology. One of these is ‘Sensory Ethnography’ (for example Pink 2009). It has been argued that traditionally anthropology privileges the Western emphasis on sight and the word and that ethnographies, in order to avoid this kind of cultural imposition, need to look at other senses such as smell, taste and touch. Another movement, specifically in the Anthropology of Religion, has argued that anthropologists should not go into the field as agnostics but should accept the possibility that the religious perspective of the group which they are studying may actually be correct and even work on the assumption that it is and engage in analysis accordingly (a point discussed in Engelke 2002).
During the same period, schools within anthropology developed based around a number of other fashionable philosophical ideologies. Feminist anthropology, like postmodern anthropology, began to come to prominence in the early 1970s. Philosophers such as Sandra Harding (1991) argued that anthropology had been dominated by men and this had led to anthropological interpretations being androcentric and a failure to appreciate the importance of women in social organizations. It has also led to androcentric metaphors in anthropological writing and focusing on research questions that mainly concern men. Strathern (1988) uses what she calls a Marxist-Feminist approach. She employs the categories of Melanesia in order to understand Melanesian gender relations to produce an ‘endogenous’ analysis of the situation. In doing so, she argues that actions in Melanesia are gender-neutral and the asymmetry between males and females is ‘action-specific.’ Thus, Melanesian women are not in any permanent state of social inferiority to men. In other words, if there is a sexual hierarchy it is de facto rather than de jure.
Critics have countered that prominent feminist interpretations have simply turned out to be empirically inaccurate. For example, feminist anthropologists, such as Weiner (1992) as well as philosopher Susan Dahlberg (1981), argued that foraging societies prized females and were peaceful and sexually egalitarian. It has been countered that this is a projection of feminist ideals which does not match with the facts (Kuznar 1997, Ch. 3). It has been argued that it does not follow that just because anthropology is male-dominated it is thus biased (Kuznar 1997, Ch. 3). However, feminist anthropologist Alison Wylie (see Risjord 1997) has argued that ‘politically motivated critiques’ including feminist ones, can improve science. Feminist critique, she argues, demonstrates the influence of ‘androcentric values’ on theory which forces scientists to hone their theories.
Another school, composed of some anthropologists from less developed countries or their descendants, have proffered a similar critique, shifting the feminist view that anthropology is androcentric by arguing that it is Euro-centric. It has been argued that anthropology is dominated by Europeans, and specifically Western Europeans and those of Western European descent, and therefore reflects European thinking and bias. For example, anthropologists from developing countries, such as Greenlandic Karla Jessen-Williamson, have argued that anthropology would benefit from the more holistic, intuitive thinking of non-Western cultures and that this should be integrated into anthropology (for example Jessen-Williamson 2006). American anthropologist Lee Baker (1991) describes himself as ‘Afro-Centric’ and argues that anthropology must be critiqued due to being based on a ‘Western’ and ‘positivistic’ tradition which is thus biased in favour of Europe. Afrocentric anthropology aims to shift this to an African (or African American) perspective. He argues that metaphors in anthropology, for example, are Euro-centric and justify the suppression of Africans. Thus, Afrocentric anthropologists wish to construct an ‘epistemology’ the foundations of which are African. The criticisms leveled against cultural relativism have been leveled with regard to such perspectives (see Levin 2005).
The positivist, empirical philosophy already discussed broadly underpins current evolutionary anthropology and there is an extent to which it, therefore, crosses over with biology. This is inline with the Consilience model, advocated by Harvard biologist Edward Wilson (b. 1929) (Wilson 1998), who has argued that the social sciences must attempt to be scientific, in order to share in the success of science, and, therefore, must be reducible to the science which underpins them. Contemporary evolutionary anthropologists, therefore, follow the scientific method, and often a quantitative methodology, to answer discrete questions and attempt to orient anthropological research within biology and the latest discoveries in this field. Also some scholars, such as Derek Freeman (1983), have defended a more qualitative methodology but, nevertheless, argued that their findings need to be ultimately underpinned by scientific research.
For example, anthropologist Pascal Boyer (2001) has attempted to understand the origins of ‘religion’ by drawing upon the latest research in genetics and in particular research into the functioning of the human mind. He has examined this alongside evidence from participant observation in an attempt to ‘explain’ religion. This subsection of evolutionary anthropology has been termed ‘Neuro-anthropology’ and attempts to better understand ‘culture’ through the latest discoveries in brain science. There are many other schools which apply different aspects of evolutionary theory – such as behavioral ecology, evolutionary genetics, paleontology and evolutionary psychology – to understanding cultural differences and different aspects of culture or subsections of culture such as ‘religion.’ Some scholars, such as Richard Dawkins (b. 1941) (Dawkins 1976), have attempted to render the study of culture more systematic by introducing the concept of cultural units – memes – and attempting to chart how and why certain memes are more successful than others, in light of research into the nature of the human brain.
Critics, in naturalist anthropology, have suggested that evolutionary anthropologists are insufficiently critical and go into the field thinking they already know the answers (for example Davies 2010). They have also argued that evolutionary anthropologists fail to appreciate that there are ways of knowing other than science. Some critics have also argued that evolutionary anthropology, with its acceptance of personality differences based on genetics, may lead to the maintenance of class and race hierarchies and to racism and discrimination (see Segerstråle 2000).
It has been argued both by scholars and journalists that anthropology, more so than other social scientific disciplines, is rent by a fundamental philosophical divide, though some anthropologists have disputed this and suggested that qualitative research can help to answer scientific research questions as long as naturalistic anthropologists accept the significance of biology.
The divide is trenchantly summarized by Lawson and McCauley (1993) who divide between ‘interpretivists’ and ‘scientists,’ or, as noted above, ‘positivists’ and ‘naturalists.’ For the scientists, the views of the ‘cultural anthropologists’ (as they call themselves) are too speculative, especially because pure ethnographic research is subjective, and are meaningless where they cannot be reduced to science. For the interpretivists, the ‘evolutionary anthropologists’ are too ‘reductionistic’ and ‘mechanistic,’ they do not appreciate the benefits of subjective approach (such as garnering information that could not otherwise be garnered), and they ignore questions of ‘meaning,’ as they suffer from ‘physics envy.’
Some anthropologists, such as Risjord (2000, 8), have criticized this divide arguing that two perspectives can be united and that only through ‘explanatory coherence’ (combining objective analysis of a group with the face-value beliefs of the group members) can a fully coherent explanation be reached. Otherwise, anthropology will ‘never reach the social reality at which it aims.’ But this seems to raise the question of what it means to ‘reach the social reality.’
In terms of physical action, the split has already been happening, as discussed in Segal and Yanagisako (2005, Ch. 1). They note that some American anthropological departments demand that their lecturers are committed to holist ‘four field anthropology’ (archaeology, cultural, biological and linguistic) precisely because of this ongoing split and in particular the divergence between biological and cultural anthropology. They observe that already by the end of the 1980s most biological anthropologists had left the American Anthropological Association. Though they argue that ‘holism’ was less necessary in Europe – because of the way that US anthropology, in focusing on Native Americans, ‘bundled’ the four – Fearn (2008) notes that there is a growing divide in British anthropology departments as well along the same dividing lines of positivism and naturalism.
Evolutionary anthropologists and, in particular, postmodern anthropologists do seem to follow philosophies with essentially different presuppositions. In November 2010, this divide became particularly contentious when the American Anthropological Association voted to remove the word ‘science’ from its Mission Statement (Berrett 2010).
University of Oulu
Last updated: April 14, 2013 | Originally published: