An apology is the act of declaring one’s regret, remorse, or sorrow for having insulted, failed, injured, harmed or wronged another. Some apologies are interpersonal (between individuals, that is, between friends, family members, colleagues, lovers, neighbours, or strangers). Other apologies are collective (by one group to another group or by a group to an individual). More generally, apologies can be offered “one to one,” “one to many,” “many to one,” or “many to many.”
While the practice of apologizing is nothing new, the end of the twentieth century and the beginning of the twenty-first witnessed a sharp rise in the number of public and political apologies, so much so that some scholars believe we are living in an “age of apology” (Gibney et al. 2006) or within a “culture of apology” (Mills 2001). A gesture formerly considered a sign of weakness has grown to represent moral strength and a crucial step towards potential reconciliation. Individuals, but more often states, churches, the judiciary, the medical profession and universities publicly issue apologies to those they have wronged in the past. Crimes ranging from personal betrayals and insults all the way to enslavement, violations of medical ethics, land displacement, violations of treaties or international law, systemic discrimination, wartime casualties, cultural disruptions, or political seizures constitute reasons for public expressions of regret.
What apologies are, and which goals they can promote, are objects of inquiry for a number of academic disciplines in the social sciences and humanities, including philosophy, political science, theology, psychology, history and sociology. Authors have been preoccupied by an array of questions: What are the validity conditions for an apology? Are these the same for interpersonal and collective apologies? And what purposes do apologies serve in human societies?
In interpersonal apologies, an individual acknowledges and promises to redress offences committed against another individual. Such an apology can be performed in private (for instance, when one family member apologizes to another within the walls of their common abode) or in public (when individuals with public profiles apologise to their spouses, friends or colleagues for their blunders in a highly mediated fashion). Although, in a broad sense, everything is political, interpersonal apologies can be political in the stricter sense when the offender and the offended are politicians, public officials or representatives of political organizations. Clear examples of interpersonal political apologies are Senator Fred Thompson’s apology to Bill Clinton for insinuating that the latter had been involved in corruption or the apology by Republican House Majority Leader Dick Armey for referring to Representative Barney Frank, a Democrat representing Massachusetts, as “Barney Fag.”
In order to count as valid, an apology must meet a number of conditions. While there is great variation among authors on the number and exact role that different elements play within an apology, there is a growing consensus that an authentic apology implies: an acknowledgement that the incident in question did in fact occur and that it was inappropriate; a recognition of responsibility for the act; the expression of an attitude of regret and a feeling of remorse; and the declaration of an intention to refrain from similar acts in the future.
Authors dealing with the interpersonal apology position themselves on a continuum, ranging from rather lax to very stringent requirements that an apology must meet in order to be valid. Nick Smith provides us with the theoretically most systematic and normatively strictest account of the interpersonal apology, listing no less than twelve conditions for what he calls a valid “categorical” apology: a corroborated factual record, the acceptance of blame (to be distinguished from expressions of sympathy as in “I am sorry for your loss”), having standing (only those causally responsible for the offence can apologise), identification of each harm separately, identification of the moral principles underlying each harm, endorsement of the moral principles underlying each harm, recognition of the victim as a moral interlocutor, categorical regret (recognition of the fact that one’s act constitute a moral failure), the performance of the apology, reform and redress (post-apology), sincere intentions (lying when apologizing would only double the insult to the victim), and some expression of emotion (sorrow, guilt, empathy, sympathy) (Smith 2008). To the extent that an interpersonal apology fails on any of these criteria, it fails to achieve the status of a proper apology.
Whether one has a more lax or a more strict understanding of the validity conditions for the interpersonal apology, the offended individual has the standing to accept or reject the apology.
Normatively, interpersonal apologies are meant to recognise the equal moral worth of the victim. While the offence cannot be undone, the act of acknowledging it recognises the offended as an equal moral agent. Psychologically, an apology aims to meet the victim’s psychological needs of recognition, thus restoring her self-respect (Lazare 2004). Diminishing her desire for revenge, healing humiliations, and facilitating reconciliation are hoped for, but empirically contingent, effects of the apology. A cathartic effect on the guilty conscience of the offender is one other psychologically desirable consequence of a successful apology.
If the apology is accepted and if the offender is forgiven, the moral status quo ante (of equal moral worth of the offending and the offended parties) will be restored. However, forgiveness follows the apology only when the victim undergoes a deep psychological change: when she gives up her moral anger and the desire for revenge. Forgiveness should not be confused with forgetting, which is involuntary and does not presuppose a “change of heart.” While possible, forgiveness is neither necessary nor a right that the offender can claim once she has apologized and shown remorse. Forgiveness remains the privilege of the offended. In addition and contrary to some religious traditions, philosophers have usually argued that forgiveness should not be understood as the victim’s duty, nor should it be conceived of as a test of her good character.
The “one to many” apology can be either private or public, and can be political or non-political. For example, when one individual apologizes privately to her family, group of friends, neighbours, or colleagues for an insult or any other moral failure, we are talking about a non-political “one to many” apology. Public figures sometimes choose to communicate their regret via mass media, and then the apology is public and non-political. For example, actress Morgan James apologized to the cast and crew of the Sondheim musical “Into the Woods” for disproportionally criticising the New York production using language that was too strong. On the contrary, when a politician or official apologizes to her party, her voters or the nation for a wrong, we are dealing with a political public “one to many” apology. Kaing Guek Eav’s (a.k.a. “Duch”) apologizing to the Cambodian people for his actions in the S21 prison or Richard Nixon apologizing to his supporters and voters for the Watergate scandal are just two among many examples of “one to many” public political apologies.
When an individual apologizes to her family, to her group of friends, or to the nation, we apply the same standards of validity that we apply to interpersonal apologies. Minimally, an apology by one to the many must include an acknowledgement that a wrong has been committed, acceptance of responsibility, a promise of forbearance, expression of regret or remorse and an offer of repair. She who has committed the wrong has the proper standing to apologize.
Things get complicated when we consider who accepts the apology. The size of the group is an important variable. A family or a group of friends can come together and decide what to do in response to the apology. A corporation or a village can organize a consultative process and determine how to react. In fact, under the banner of “restorative justice”, an entire literature addresses the ways in which communities can heal broken relations and re-integrate those among their members who have gone astray (Braithwaite 1989). But how do large, unorganized groups, such as nations, accept an apology? Many critics of restorative justice have pointed out that such a conception of justice does not make much sense outside small, closely knit communities. Can there ever be consensus about how to deal with officials’ expressions of regret within the large, pluralistic publics of today’s societies? Elections and opinion polls are probably the only – imperfect – mechanisms for gaining insight into whether an apology has or has not been accepted by the members of the polity. While a great deal of attention has been paid to the normative pre-requisites of a valid apology, there are no systematic studies regarding their effect on the public culture of the societies in which they are offered. This is an important lacuna in great need of remedy.
The purposes of the non-political “one to many” apology overlap with those of the interpersonal acts of contrition: recognizing the victims as moral interlocutors and communicating the fact that the offender understands and regrets the violation of their legitimate moral expectations, thus making a first step towards a desired reconciliation.
Beside the acknowledgement and recognition functions of the political variety of the “one to many” apology, such acts also seek to satisfy the publicity requirement and set the record straight, re-affirm the principles the community abides by and, in giving an account of one’s personal failures as a politician or representative, they individualize guilt. Strategically, such acts may be employed to minimize political losses, save one’s political career and, if that were not possible, to insulate one’s office or party from the negative consequences of a particular person’s misdeeds. It may also be used to increase the chances of a pardon in case the misdeeds are of a criminal nature.
Collective apologies take two forms: by “many to many” or by “many to one”. In the case of “many to many” one group apologizes to another group. For instance, the French railway company SNCF apologized for transporting Jews to the extermination camps during the Nazi occupation and the Vatican apologized to women for the violations of their rights and historical denigration at the hands of the Catholic Church. In the case of “many to one” a group apologizes to an individual. Clear examples are the apology by the Canadian government to Maher Arar for the ordeal he suffered as a result of his rendition to Syria or corporate apologies to individual clients for faulty services or goods.
When looking into collective apologies, the state has received most of the scholarly attention as perpetrator and apologizer. In addressing the issue of state apologies, we can speak of three contexts where such acts are considered appropriate: domestic, international and postcolonial. In the domestic realm, political apologies address injustice committed against citizens under the aegis of the state. Canada’s apology and compensation to Canadians of Chinese origin for the infamous “Chinese Head Tax” law and the United State’s apology and compensation for American citizens of Japanese descent for their internment during World War II are relevant examples. In the international realm, political apologies are important diplomatic tools and usually address injustice committed during wartime, but not only. In this category, we could discuss Japan’s “sorry” for the abuse of Korean and Chinese “comfort women” and Belgium’s expression of regret for not having intervened to prevent the genocide in Rwanda. Finally, one can identify postimperial and postcolonial relations as a context, somewhere between the domestic and the international realm. Australia’s and Canada’s apologies to their Aboriginal communities for forced assimilation policies, Queen Elizabeth’s declaration of sorrow for Britain’s treatment of New Zealand’s Maori communities, and Guatemala’s apology to a victimized Mayan community constitute important illustrations.
When applied to collective apologies for harms and wrongs featuring multiple perpetrators – oftentimes committed a long time ago – many of Smith’s criteria for a categorical “sorry” do not hold. Consequently, those who measure collective apologies against the standards for interpersonal apologies argue against the very idea of collective apologies, and especially against the idea of collective apologies for injustices that took place in the distant past.
First, adequately isolating each and every offence inflicted upon the victim(s) can be a daunting task when dealing with multiple perpetrators. Secondly, what do we mean by collective responsibility? In what way can we plausibly speak of collective – as opposed to individual – acts? Third, who has the proper standing to apologize for something that the collective has supposedly perpetrated: the upper echelons of the chain of command or the direct perpetrators? What about those members of the group who had not been involved in the violations? Fourth, can groups express remorse and regret? How can we measure their sincerity and commitment to transformation and redress in the absence of these emotions? Fifth, things are further complicated because often there is no consensus behind a collective’s decision to apologize.
Most of the time, some members of the community reject the idea of apologizing for a past wrong. They see public contrition as a threat to the self-image of the group and as an unnecessary tainting of its history. All recent examples of collective apologies have turned out to be controversial and antagonizing, so much so that some scholars have argued that the lack of consensus constitutes an insuperable obstacle to collective apologies. Last but not least, who should accept these collective apologies? The answer appears to be clear in the case of a “many to one” apology. But what about a “many to many” scenario? The direct victims? What about their families? And what if the members of the group that the apology addresses cannot agree on whether to accept the apology or not?
All these problems are amplified when the direct perpetrators and victims no longer exist. In such cases, there is no identity between perpetrator and apologiser or between the victim and the addressee of the apology. What is more, the potential apologizers and addressees of the apology often owe their very existence to the fact that the injustices had been committed in the past, as is the case, for example, of almost everyone in the Americas or Australia today: without the injustices committed against the First Nations and without the slave trade the demographics of the continents would look different in the 21st Century. For them to apologize sincerely, i.e. to express regret for the very events that made their existence possible, would be impossible.
One way of circumventing the identity problem is to argue that, even if they are not the direct victims, the descendants of victims suffer today the repercussions of the violations in the past. For instance, one might argue that African Americans experience today the socio-economic repercussions of a history of discrimination and oppression that goes back to the slave trade. Consequently, they are owed an apology. White Americans, on the contrary, have been the beneficiaries of the same violations, even if they are not the direct perpetrators thereof. As involuntary beneficiaries of violence they might express regret for the fact that they owe their existence to injustices committed by their ancestors.
Yet the problems do not stop here. Immigration adds to the complexity of the identity problem: should recent immigrants apologise given that they have not even benefitted from the past injustices and they do not owe their existence to the perpetrators of past injustices?
Another way of dealing with the question of the validity of collective apologies is to give up the interpersonal model and think of them as a rather distinct category, whose purposes and functions differ from those of interpersonal apologies. Thus, scholars have argued that it is normatively sound to ascribe responsibility to collectives or institutions as continuous in time and as transcending the particular individuals constituting them at a certain moment. In addition, collectives are responsible for reproducing the culture that made it possible for atrocities to go on uncontested. Therefore, collective responsibility requires that groups’ representatives acknowledge the fact that an injustice has been committed, mark discontinuity with the discriminatory practices of the past, and commit themselves to non-repetition and redress.
Collective responsibility must be conceptually distinguished from collective guilt, a philosophically more problematic notion. For example, a present government who has not committed any wrongs can still take responsibility by acknowledging that wrongs have been committed against a certain group or person in the past, that it was “our culture” that enabled the abuses, that the abuses have repercussions in the present, and that they will not be allowed to happen again. A pledge to revise the very foundations on which the relations between various groups are established within the polity and material compensations for the losses incurred by the victims give concreteness to the apology. In this sense, it can be safely said that collective apologies have both a symbolic function (recognition of the offended group as worthy of respect) and a utility function (the apology might bring about reparations to the victims and might lead to better inter-group relations).
If the issue of collective responsibility is addressed in this way, we then need to turn to the question of who has standing to apologize for the collective. Unlike interpersonal apologies—where the offender has to apologize to the offended—collective apologies depend on representation, or, in other words, they are done by proxy. If we understand collective apologies as symbolic acts and if we agree that collectives can take responsibility for past wrongs even if their current members did not commit any of the past offences, then a legitimate representative – perceived by the collective as having the authority to speak for the collective – has the standing to apologize.
Naturally, the affective dimension of the collective apology becomes less significant if we give up the interpersonal model. The representatives offering the apology might experience feelings of contrition, remorse and regret, but their emotional response is not a necessary condition of an authentic apology by collective agents such as churches, professions, or the state. While representatives speaking on behalf of the group or institution may experience such emotions, the sincerity of the act should not be measured in affective units. The “sincerity” of collective apologies should be measured in terms of what follows from the act. Changes in the norms and practices of the collective, reparations, compensation, or memorialization projects give concreteness to the symbolic act of apologizing.
Last but not least, to whom is the apology addressed? Theorists who do not take the interpersonal “sorry” as a template for the collective apology argue that they are addressed to a number of audiences. First, apologies are directed towards victims and their families and their descendants. Secondly, they are addressed to the general public, with a view to communicating that what happened in the past is in great tension with the moral principles the group subscribes to and that such abuses will not be tolerated ever again. Lastly, the international society – or more abstractly humanity as a whole – is the indirect audience of a collective apology.
If we agree that we can speak meaningfully about public expressions of regret by institutions, then we will also think that they do not serve the same purposes as interpersonal apologies. Such acts aim to restore diplomatic relations, restore the dignity of insulted groups, extend the boundaries of the political community by including the formerly disenfranchised, re-establish equality among groups and recognize suffering, and stimulate reflection and change in a discriminatory public culture. They could also mark a (re-)affirmation of the fundamental moral principles of the community, promote national reconciliation, strengthen a principle of transnational cooperation and contribute to the improvement of international law and diplomatic relations, make a relationship possible by creating a less hostile environment for special groups, and mark a society’s affirmation of a set of virtues in contradistinction to a past of exclusion.
Theological approaches to the functions that collective apologies can perform add to the scholarly reflection about these political practices. In her path-breaking book on the religious dimensions of collective apologies, Celermajer uses insights from the Jewish and the Christian notions and institutions of repentance in order to support an account of collective apologies as speech acts through which “we as a community” ritually express shame for our past, appraise the impact of the past on the present and the future, and make a commitment to change who “we” are by bridging the gap between our ideals and our practices (Celermajer 2009). Other scholars have made reference to the Christian notion of covenant so as to theorise apologies as “embracing” acts and as mechanisms of possible reconciliation. Contributions by theologians thus illuminate one more normative source for the multi-faceted practice of apology: religious traditions.
While many scholars see public apologies as creating a space of communal reflection and restoration, there are strong sceptical positions that see such official acts as nothing but a “smoke screen” meant to hide the intention to avoid responsibility or further projects of assimilation and discrimination. On the basis of normative inconsistencies associated with current practices of apologies, realist scholars have objected that apologies are a form of “sentimental politics” that serves as a “seductive, feel-good strategy contrived and promoted by governments” to compensate for the lack of redistributive measures. On this view, apologies allow political elites to take the higher moral ground against those who came before them—unfairly applying current standards to the past, thus committing the sin of presentism – and to capitalize electorally.
Defenders of the value of collective apology respond that the presence of strategic reasons does not necessarily doom such practices to irrelevance. True, unless coupled with compensatory schemes and a renunciation of oppressive practices, such declarations of sorrow are signs of hypocritical and meaningless righteousness, far from appropriately addressing the atrocities for which they are issued. Compensation without an apology is also insufficient, as it cannot symbolically affirm the value of the victims. In addition, it might send the wrong signal – that of trying to “buy” the victim’s forgiveness, thus doubling the insult. To the extent that they live up to the tasks they set themselves, i.e. to the extent that they take concrete steps to address injustice symbolically and materially, apologies are “sincere”.
A different kind of criticism comes from conservative commentators who tend to be averse to the idea of apologizing for a past of state-sponsored violence. The fear that discussing the past might damage the community’s self-image pervades many democratic societies with a history of injustice. Turkey’s refusal to acknowledge the Armenian genocide and the US’s problematic relationship with its long history of racial discrimination are two notorious examples where a discomfort with the past prevents sincere processes of national reckoning.
In response to this line of critique, one can argue that democratic elites can employ two strategies: encourage everyone to participate in a political ritual of contrition and assume the unsavoury past or invite resistant groups to conceive of honesty about the past as an act of courage, not an injustice. A rhetorically powerful appeal to positive feelings of courage, rather than shame, to pride, rather than repentance, could persuade citizens to see the apology as a sign of strength, and not one of weakness.
The theatrical or ritualistic dimension of the collective apology cannot be omitted from any comprehensive discussion of the practice. While public interpersonal apologies by celebrities can be analysed in terms of their theatrical aspects – just think of Arnold Schwarzenegger or Tiger Woods publicly apologizing to their spouses – it is usually collective political apologies that make a more interesting object for this type of inquiry.
Rhetoricians have pointed to the need for the apologizer to establish a special relation between herself and the audience. She should be able to give meaningful expression to common sentiment and avoid being perceived as out of touch with the public. Timing, the rhetorical register used, the tone, the educational and memorialization projects that precede the apology, and the theatrical props used should enter the consideration of those who want their apology to resonate with the wider public. Thinking of the apology in terms of theatre allows us to grasp not only the validity and power of the performance by the apologizer but also the choice that the spectator has to either accept or reject the authority of the apologizer.
While apologies have been mostly studied as verbal (oral or written) acts, some scholars have recently turned their attention to the non-verbal dimension of the practice. Willy Brandt’s kneeling in front of the monument dedicated to the Warsaw Ghetto uprising in 1970 or Pope John Paul II leaning against the Western Wall and slipping a piece of paper containing a prayer into its crevices have been interpreted as acts of apology, regret and sorrow for the suffering of the Jews at the hands of Nazi Germany and the Catholic Church, respectively. Looking into gestures, bodily posture, location and emotional expressions allows us to understand the complexity of factors that enter into an apology that resonates with its audiences, thus adding richness to any analysis of such practices.
The phenomenon of intercultural apologies – interpersonal and collective apologies between individuals with different cultural backgrounds – has been made the object of numerous empirical studies. Such studies usually compare “Western” (mostly American) and “Eastern” (mostly East-Asian) understandings of the apology.
While apologies do cut across cultures, sociologists, social psychologists and students of intercultural communication tell us that there is variation in the type and number of validity conditions, the nature of acts that should give occasion to an apology, the strength of the motivation to apologize, the kind of purposes that they are meant to serve, as well as in the form and style that the practice adopts. For instance, Western individuals and institutions are supposedly less willing to apologize, more likely to focus on the mens rea (the intention behind the offence) and on the justification of the offence, while Asian individuals and institutions are more willing to apologize unconditionally, more likely to zoom in on the consequences of the offence, and see it within its broader context.
Such variation might tempt the observer to essentialize cultures, reify the differences, and deny the possibility of meaningful apologies between members of different cultural groups. The more difficult – yet more productive – alternative is to resist the temptation of going down the path of incommensurability and to try and valorise the reconciliation potential such acts may bring about. A willingness to see the similarities beyond the differences, to adjust one’s expectations so as to accommodate the expectations of the other and to learn transculturally may pave the way to conflict resolution, be it between persons or collectives.
University of York
Last updated: August 19, 2013 | Originally published: