Metaphysics is taken by Thomas Aquinas to be the study of being qua being, that is, a study of the most fundamental aspects of being that constitute a being and without which it could not be. Aquinas’s metaphysical thought follows a modified but general Aristotelian view. Primarily, for Aquinas, a thing cannot be unless it possesses an act of being, and the thing that possesses an act of being is thereby rendered an essence/existence composite. If an essence has an act of being, the act of being is limited by that essence whose act it is. The essence in itself is the definition of a thing; and the paradigm instances of essence/existence composites are material substances (though not all substances are material for Aquinas; for example, God is not). A material substance (say, a cat or a tree) is a composite of matter and form, and it is this composite of matter and form that is primarily said to exist. In other words, the matter/form composite is predicated neither of, nor in, anything else and is the primary referent of being; all other things are said of it. The details of this very rich metaphysical landscape are described below.
Saint Thomas, that is, Aquinas, clarifies the nature of metaphysics through ascertaining its particular subject-matter, its field of investigation. In order to ascertain the subject-matter of any particular science, Thomas distinguishes between the different intellectual operations that we use when engaged in some particular scientific endeavor. Broadly speaking, these fall into two categories: the speculative and the practical. Concerning some sciences, the intellect is merely speculative by contemplating the truth of some particular subject-matter; while concerning other sciences, the intellect is practical, by ascertaining the truth and seeking to apply. There are thus correspondingly two distinct classes of science: speculative science and practical science. Speculative sciences are those that contemplate truth whereas practical sciences are those that apply truth for some practical purpose. The sciences are then further distinguished through differentiating their various subject-matters.
Insofar as the speculative sciences merely contemplate truth but do not apply it for some practical purpose, the subject-matter of the speculative sciences is that which can be understood to some extent. Working within the Aristotelian tradition, Thomas holds that something is understood when it is separated from matter and is necessary to thing in some respect. For instance, when we understand the nature of a tree, what we understand is not primarily the matter that goes to constitute the tree in question, but what it is to be a tree, or the structuring principle of the matter that so organizes it and specifies it as a tree rather than a plant. Furthermore, assuming our understanding is correct, when we understand a thing to be a tree, we do not understand it to be a dog, or a horse, or a cat. Thus, in our understanding of a tree, we understand that which is necessary for the tree to be a tree, and not of anything that is not a tree. Hence, our understanding of a thing is separated from its matter and is necessary to it in some respect. Now, what is in motion is not necessary, since what is in motion can change. Thus, the degree to which we have understood something is conditional upon the degree to which it is separated from matter and motion. It follows then that speculative objects, the subject-matter of the speculative-sciences, insofar as they are what are understood, will be separated from matter and motion to some degree. Any distinctions that obtain amongst speculative objects will in turn signify distinctions amongst the sciences that consider those objects; and we can find distinctions amongst speculative objects based upon their disposition towards matter and motion.
There are three divisions that can apply to speculative objects, thereby permitting us to differentiate the sciences that consider such objects: (i) there is a class of speculative objects that are dependent on matter and motion both for their being and for their being understood, for instance, human beings cannot be without matter, and they cannot be understood without their constituent matter (flesh and bones); (ii) there is a class of speculative objects that depend on matter and motion for their being, but not for their being understood, for instance, we can understand lines, numbers, and points without thereby understanding the matter in which they are found, yet such things cannot be without matter; (iii) there is a class of speculative objects that depend on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood.
Given these three classes of speculative objects, the speculative sciences that consider them can be enumerated accordingly: (i) physical science considers those things that depend on matter and motion both for their being and for their being understood; (ii) mathematics considers those things that depend on matter and motion for their being but not for their being understood; (iii) metaphysics or theology deals with those things that depend on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood. Before going on to consider the subject-matter of metaphysics in a little more detail, it is important to point out that Thomas takes this division of the speculative sciences as exhaustive. For Thomas, there could be no fourth speculative science; the reason for this is that the subject-matter of such a science would have to be those things that depend on matter and motion for their being understood but not for their being, for all other combinations have been exhausted. Now, if a thing depends on matter and motion for its being understood but not for its being, then matter and motion would be put into its definition, which defines a thing as it exists. But if a thing’s existence is so defined as to include matter and motion, then it follows that it depends on matter and motion for its being; for it cannot be understood to be without matter and motion. Hence, all things that include matter and motion in their definitions are dependent on matter and motion for their being, but not all things that depend on matter and motion for their being depend on matter and motion for their being understood. There could be no fourth speculative science since there is no fourth class of speculative objects depending on matter and motion for their being understood but not for their being. Thomas thus sees this threefold division of the speculative sciences as an exhaustive one.
The third class of speculative objects comprises the objects of metaphysics or theology. Now Thomas does not equate these two disciplines, but goes on to distinguish between the proper subject-matter of metaphysics and the proper subject-matter of theology. Recall that this third class of speculative objects comprises those things depending on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood. Such things are thus immaterial things; however, Thomas here draws a distinction. There are things that are immaterial insofar as they are in themselves complete immaterial substances; God and the angels would be examples of such things. To give the latter a title, let them be called positively immaterial. On the other hand there are things that are immaterial insofar as they simply do not depend on matter and motion, but can nevertheless be sometimes said to be found therein. In other words, things of the latter category are neutral with respect to being found in matter and motion, and hence they are neutrally immaterial. St Thomas’s examples of the latter are: being, substance, potency, form, act, one and many; such things can apply equally to material things (such as humans, dogs, cats, mice) and, to some extent, to positively immaterial things. Thus, the neutrally immaterial seem to signify certain aspects or modes of being that can apply equally to material and to immaterial things. The question then arises: what is the proper subject-matter of metaphysics: the positively immaterial or the neutrally immaterial?
According to Thomas, unaided human reason cannot have direct knowledge of the positively immaterial; this is because such things (God and angels) outstrip the human intellect’s capacity to know. Nevertheless, direct knowledge of the positively immaterial is possible, but this will not be on the basis of unaided human reason; it will require that the positively immaterial reveal themselves to us in some way, in which case direct knowledge of the positively immaterial will be dependent on some sort of revelation. As it is a purely rational science, not dependent on or presupposing the truths of revelation, metaphysics will be a study of the neutrally immaterial aspects of things, that is, a study of those modes of being that apply to all beings, whether they are material or immaterial. Such a study will be in accord with the Aristotelian conception of metaphysics as a study of being qua being, insofar as the neutrally immaterial apply to all beings and are not restricted to a certain class of beings. However, Thomas does not adopt the Aristotelian phrase (being qua being) as the subject-matter of metaphysics, he offers his own term. According to Thomas, ens commune (common being) is the proper subject-matter of metaphysics. Through an investigation of ens commune, an investigation into the aspects of being common to all beings, the metaphysician may indeed come to a knowledge of the causes of being and might thereby be led to the affirmation of divine being, but this is only at the end of the metaphysical inquiry, not at the beginning. Thus, metaphysics for Aquinas is a study of ens commune where this is understood as the common aspects of being without which a thing could not be; it does not presuppose the existence of divine being, and may not even be led to an affirmation of divine being (though Thomas of course offers several highly complex metaphysical arguments for the existence of divine being, but this should not be taken to be essential to the starting point of Thomistic metaphysics).
Metaphysics then is a study of the certain aspects common to all beings; and it is the task of the metaphysician to uncover the aspects of being that are indeed common and without which a thing could not be. There are certain aspects of being that are common insofar as they are generally applicable to all beings, and these are essence and existence; all beings exist and have an essence, hence metaphysics will be primarily concerned with the nature of essence and existence and their relationship to each other. Having completed an investigation into essence and existence, the metaphysician must investigate the aspects of being that are common to particular instances of being; and this will be a study of (i) the composition of substance and accident, and (ii) the composition of matter and form. The format of Thomistic metaphysics then takes a somewhat dyadic structure of descending generality: (i) essence and existence, (ii) substance and accident, (iii) matter and form. The format of the remainder of this article will be an investigation into these dyadic structures.
A general notion of essence is the following: essence is the definable nature of the thing that exists. Quite generally then, the essence of a thing is signified by its definition. The immediate question then is how the essence of a thing relates to its existence. In finite entities, essence is that which has existence, but it is not existence; this is a crude articulation of Thomas’s most fundamental metaphysical teaching: that essence and existence are distinct in finite entities. A consideration then of essence and existence in Thomas’s metaphysical thought will thus be a consideration of his fundamental teaching that essence and existence are distinct.
The most famous, and to a certain degree the most controversial, instance wherein Thomas argues for a distinction between a thing’s essence and its existence is in De Ente et Essentia [On Being and Essence] Chapter Four. The context is a discussion of immaterial substances and whether or not they are composed of matter. In that passage, Thomas is concerned with a popular medieval discussion known as universal hylemorphism. St Bonaventure, Thomas’s contemporary, had held that insofar as creatures are in potency in some respect, they must be material in some respect, since on the Aristotelian account, matter is the principle of potency in a thing. Thus, creatures, even immaterial creatures, must be material in some respect, even if this materiality is nothing like our corporeal materiality. Thomas takes up this issue in De Ente Chapter 4, pointing out that the Jewish thinker Avicebron seems to have been the author of this position.
Thomas takes the notion of universal hylemorphism to be absurd. Not only does it conflict with the common sayings of the philosophers, but also it is precisely as separated from matter and all material conditions that we deem separate (immaterial) substances separate, in which case they cannot be composed of matter. But if such substances cannot be composed of matter, what accounts for their potentiality? Such substances are not God, they are not pure act, they are in potentiality in some respect. So, if they are not material, then how are they in potency? Thomas is thus led to hold that they have an element of potentiality, but this is not the potency supplied by matter; rather, immaterial substances are composed of essence and existence, and it is the essence of the thing, standing in potency to a distinct act of existence, that accounts for the potentiality of creatures and thereby distinguishes them from God, who is not so composed. Thomas’s argumentation for the distinction between essence and existence unfolds on three stages and for each stage there has been at least one commentator who has held that Thomas both intended and established the real distinction therein.
In the first stage Thomas argues as follows. Whatever does not enter into the understanding of any essence is composed with that essence from without; for we cannot understand an essence without understanding the parts of that essence. But we can understand the essence of something without knowing anything about its existence; for instance, one can understand the essence of a man or a phoenix without thereby understanding the existence of either. Hence, essence and existence are distinct.
This little paragraph has generated considerable controversy, insofar as it is unclear what sort of distinction Thomas intends to establish at this stage. Is it merely a logical distinction whereby it is one thing to understand the essence of a thing and another to understand its existence? On this account, essence and existence could well be identical in the thing yet distinct in our understanding thereof (just as ‘Morning star’ and ‘Evening star’ are distinct in our conceptual expressions of the planet Venus, yet both are identical with Venus). On the other hand, does Thomas attempt to establish a real distinction whereby essence and existence are not only distinct in our understanding, but also in the thing itself? Commentators who hold that this stage only establishes a logical distinction focus on the fact that Thomas is here concerned only with our understanding of essence and not with actual (real) things; such commentators include Joseph Owens and John Wippel. Commentators who hold that this stage establishes a real distinction focus on the distinction between the act of understanding a thing’s essence and the act of knowing its existence, and they argue that a distinction in cognitional acts points to a distinction in reality; such commentators include Walter Patt, Anthony Kenny, and Steven Long.
In the second stage of argumentation, Thomas claims that if there were a being whose essence is its existence, there could only be one such being, in all else essence and existence would differ. This is clear when we consider how things can be multiplied. A thing can be multiplied in one of three ways: (i) as a genus is multiplied into its species through the addition of some difference, for instance the genus ‘animal’ is multiplied into the species ‘human’ through the addition of ‘rational’; (ii) as a species is multiplied into its individuals through being composed with matter, for instance the species ‘human’ is multiplied into various humans through being received in diverse clumps of matter; (iii) as a thing is absolute and shared in by many particular things, for instance if there were some absolute fire from which all other fires were derived. Thomas claims that a being whose essence is its existence could not be multiplied in either of the first two ways (he does not consider the third way, presumably because in that case the thing that is received or participated in is not itself multiplied; the individuals are multiplied and they simply share in some single absolute reality). A being whose essence is its existence could not be multiplied (i) through the addition of some difference, for then its essence would not be its existence but its existence plus some difference, nor could it be multiplied (ii) through being received in matter, for then it would not be subsistent, but it must be subsistent if it exists in virtue of what it is. Overall then, if there were a being whose essence is its existence, it would be unique, there could only be one such being, in all else essence and existence are distinct.
Notice that Thomas has once again concluded that essence and existence are distinct. John Wippel takes this to be the decisive stage in establishing that essence and existence are really distinct. He argues that insofar as it is impossible for there to be more than one being whose essence is its existence, there could not be in reality many such beings, in which case if we grant that there are multiple beings in reality, such beings are composed of essence and existence. On the other hand, Joseph Owens has charged Wippel with an ontological move and claims that Wippel is arguing from some positive conceptual content, to the actuality of that content in reality. Owens argues that we cannot establish the real distinction until we have established that there is something whose essence is its existence. Given the existence of a being whose essence is its existence, we can contrast its existence with the existence of finite things, and conclude that the latter are composites of essence and existence; and so Owens sees the real distinction as established at stage three of Thomas’s argumentation: the proof that there actually is a being whose essence is its existence.
Thomas begins stage three with the premise that whatever belongs to a thing belongs to it either through its intrinsic principles, its essence, or from some extrinsic principle. A thing cannot be the cause of its own existence, for then it would have to precede itself in existence, which is absurd. Everything then whose essence is distinct from its existence must be caused to be by another. Now, what is caused to be by another is led back to what exists in itself (per se). There must be a cause then for the existence of things, and this because it is pure existence (esse tantum); otherwise an infinite regress of causes would ensue.
It is here that Owens believes that Thomas establishes the real distinction; since Thomas establishes (to his own satisfaction) that there exists a being whose essence is its existence. Consequently, we can contrast the existence of such a being with the existence of finite entities and observe that in the latter existence is received as from an efficient cause whereas in the former it is not. Thus, essence and existence are really distinct. However, it is important to note that on this interpretation, the real distinction could not enter into the argument for the existence of a being whose essence is its existence; for, on Owens’s account, such argumentation is taken to establish the real distinction. If it can be shown then that Thomas’s argumentation for the existence of a being whose essence is its existence does presuppose the real distinction, then Owens’s views as to the stage at which the real distinction is established would be considerably undermined.
Having established (at some stage) that essence and existence are distinct and that there exists a being whose essence is its existence, Thomas goes on to conclude that in immaterial substances, essence is related to existence as potency to act. The latter follows insofar as what receives existence stands in potency to the existence that it receives. But all things receive existence from the being whose essence is its existence, in which case the existence that any one finite thing possesses is an act of existence that actuates a corresponding potency: the essence. Thomas has thus shown that immaterial substances do indeed have an element of potency, but this need not be a material potency.
Notice that here Thomas correlates essence and existence as potency and act only after he has concluded to the existence of a being whose essence is its existence (God). One wonders then whether or not essence and existence can be related as potency and act only on the presupposition of the existence of God. Regardless of his preferred method in the De Ente Chapter 4, Thomas could very well have focussed on the efficiently caused character of existence in finite entities (as he does in the opening lines of the argument for the existence of God), and argued that insofar as existence is efficiently caused (whether or not this is from God), existence stands to that in which it inheres as act to potency, in which case the essence that possesses existence stands in potency to that act of existence. Therefore, Thomas need not presuppose the existence of God in order to hold that essence and existence are related as potency and act; all he need presuppose is (i) that essence and existence are distinct and (ii) that existence is efficiently caused in the essence/existence composite.
Essence/existence composites merely have existence; whatever an essence/existence composite is, it is not its existence. Insofar as essence/existence composites merely have, but are not, existence, they participate in existence in order to exist. This is a second of Thomas’s fundamental metaphysical teachings: whatever does not essentially exist, merely participates in existence. Insofar as no essence/existence composite essentially exists, all essence/existence composites merely participate in existence. More specifically, the act of existence that each and every essence/existence composite possesses is participated in by the essence that exists.
As a definition of participation, Thomas claims that to participate is to take a part (in) (partem capere) something. Following this definition, Thomas goes on to explain how one thing can be said to take a part in and thereby participate in another; this can happen in three ways.
Firstly, when something receives in a particular fashion what pertains universally to another, it is said to participate in that other; for example, a species (‘man’) is said to participate in its genus (‘animal’) and an individual (Socrates) is said to participate in its species (‘man’) because they (the species and the individual) do not possess the intelligible structure of that in which they participate according to its full universality.
Secondly, a subject is said to participate in the accidents that it has (for instance, a man is a certain colour, and thereby participates in the colour of which he is), and matter is said to participate in the formal structure that it has (for instance, the matter of a statue participates in the shape of that statue in order to be the statue in question).
Thirdly, an effect can be said to participate in its cause, especially when the effect is not equal to the power of that cause. The effect particularises and determines the scope of the cause; for the effect acts as the determinate recipient of the power of the cause. The effect receives from its cause only that which is necessary for the production of the effect. It is in this way that a cause is participated in by its effect.
In all of the foregoing modes of participation, to participate is to limit that which is participated in some respect. This follows from the original etymological definition of participation, that to participate is to take a part (in); for if to participate is merely to take a part in something, the participant will not possess the nature of the thing in which it participates in any total fashion, but only in partial fashion. What then can we conclude about the participation framework that governs essence and existence?
Essences exist, but they do not exist essentially, they participate in their acts of existence. Insofar as an essence participates in its act of existence, the essence limits that act of existence to the nature of the essence whose act it is; for the essence merely has existence, it is not existence, in which case its possession of existence will be in accord with the nature of the essence. The act of existence is thus limited and thereby individuated to the essence whose act it is. As a concrete application of this, consider the following. George Bush’s existence is not Tony Blair’s existence; when George Bush came into existence, Tony Blair did not come into existence, and when George Bush ceases to exist, Tony Blair will, in all likelihood, not cease to exist. George Bush’s existence is not indexed to the existence of Tony Blair, in which case the existence of either George Bush or Tony Blair is not identical to the other. The act of existence then is individuated to the essence whose act it is, and this because the essence merely participates in, and thereby limits, the act of existence that it possesses.
The next fundamental metaphysical category is that of substance. According to Aquinas, substances are what are primarily said to exist, and so substances are what have existence but yet are not identical with existence. Aquinas’s ontology then is comprised primarily of substances, and all change is either a change of one substance into another substance, or a modification of an already existing substance. Given that essence is that which is said to possess existence, but is not identical to existence, substances are essence/existence composites; their existence is not guaranteed by what they are. They simply have existence as limited by their essence.
Let us begin with a logical definition of substance, as this will give us an indication of its metaphysical nature. Logically speaking, a substance is what is predicated neither of nor in anything else. This captures the fundamental notion that substances are basic, and everything else is predicated either of or in them. Now, if we transpose this logical definition of substance to the realm of metaphysics, where existence is taken into consideration, we can say that a substance is that whose nature it is to exist not in some subject or as a part of anything else, but what exists in itself. Thus, a substance is a properly basic entity, existing per se (though of course depending on an external cause for its existence), and the paradigm instances of which are the medium sized objects that we see around us: horses, cats, trees and humans.
On the other hand there are accidents. Accidents are what accrue to substances and modify substances in some way. Logically speaking, accidents are predicated of or in some substance; metaphysically speaking, accidents cannot exist in themselves but only as part of some substance. As their name suggests, accidents are incidental to the thing, and they can come and go without the thing losing its identity; whereas a thing cannot cease to be the substance that it is without losing its identity.
Accidents only exist as part of some substance. It follows then that we cannot have un-exemplified properties as if they were substances in themselves. Properties are always exemplified by some substance, whereas substance itself is un-exemplifiable. For example, brown is always predicated of something, we say that x is brown, in which case brown is an accident. However, brown is never found to be in itself, it is always exemplified by something of which it is said.
Within Aquinas’s metaphysical framework, substances can be both material (cats, dogs, humans) and immaterial (angels), but as noted above, the paradigm instances of substances are material substances, and the latter are composites of matter and form; a material substance is neither its matter alone nor its form alone, since matter and form are always said to be of some individual and never in themselves. It follows then that material substances have parts, and the immediate question arises as to whether or not the parts of substances are themselves substances. In order to address this issue, we must ask two questions: (i) while they are parts of a substance, are such parts themselves substances? and (ii) are the parts of a substance themselves things that can exist without the substance of which they are parts?
Concerning (i) we must say that whilst they are parts of a substance such parts cannot be substances; this is so given the definition of substance outlined above: that whose nature it is to exist not in some subject. Given that the parts of a substance are in fact parts of a substance, it is their nature to exist in some subject of which they are a part. Consequently, the parts of a substance cannot themselves be substances.
Concerning (ii) the case is somewhat different, now we must consider whether or not the parts of a substance can exist without the substance of which they are parts, that is, after the dissolution of the substance of which they are parts do the parts become substances in themselves? The parts of a substance receive their identity through being the parts of the substance whose parts they are. Thus, the flesh and bone of a human are flesh and bone precisely because they are parts of a human. When the human dies, the flesh and bone are no longer flesh and bone (except equivocally speaking) because they are no longer parts of a human substance; rather, the flesh and bone cease to function as flesh and bone and begin to decompose, in which case they are not themselves substances. However, on Aquinas’s view, the elements out of which a substance is made can indeed subsist beyond the dissolution of the substance. Thus, whilst the elements are parts of the substance, they are not, as parts of a substance, substances in themselves, but when the substance dissolves, the elements will remain as independent substances in their own right. Thus, in the case of the dissolution of the human being, whilst the flesh and bone no longer remain but decompose, the elements that played a role in the formation of the substance remain. In more contemporary terms we could say that before they go to make up the bodily substances we see in the world, atoms are substances in themselves, but when united in a certain form they go to make cats, dogs, humans, and cease to be independent substances in themselves. When the cat or dog or human perishes, its flesh and bones perish with it, but its atoms regain their substantial nature and they remain as substances in themselves. So, a substance can have its parts, and for as long as those parts are parts of a substance, those parts are not substances in themselves, but when the substance decomposes, those parts can be considered as substances in themselves so long as they are capable of subsisting in themselves.
A very crude definition of matter would be that it is the ‘stuff’ out of which a thing is made, whereas form is signified by the organisation that the matter takes. A common example used by Aquinas and his contemporaries for explaining matter and form was that of a statue. Consider a marble statue. The marble is the matter of the statue whereas the shape signifies the form of the statue. The marble is the ‘stuff’ out of which the statue is made whereas the shape signifies the form that the artist decided to give to the statue. On a more metaphysical level, form is the principle whereby the matter has the particular structure that it has, and matter is simply that which stands to be structured in a certain way. It follows from this initial account that matter is a principle of potency in a thing; since if the matter is that which stands to be structured in a certain way, matter can be potentially an indefinite number of forms. Form on the other hand is not potentially one thing or another; form as form is the kind of thing that it is and no other.
On Aquinas’s account, there are certain levels of matter/form composition. On one level we can think of the matter of a statue as being the marble whereas we can think of the shape of the statue as signifying the form. But on a different level with can think of the marble as signifying the form and something more fundamental being the matter. For instance, before the marble was formed into the statue by the sculptor, it was a block of marble, already with a certain form that made it ‘marble’. At this level, the marble cannot be the matter of the thing, since its being marble and not, say, granite, is its form. Thus, there is a more fundamental level of materiality that admits of being formed in such a way that the end product is marble or granite, and at a higher level, this formed matter stands as matter for the artist when constructing the statue.
If we think of matter as without any form, we come to the notion of prime matter, and this is a type of matter that is totally unformed, pure materiality itself. Prime matter is the ultimate subject of form, and in itself indefinable; we can only understand prime matter through thinking of matter as wholly devoid of form. As wholly devoid of form prime matter is neither a substance nor any of the other categories of being; prime matter, as pure potency, cannot in fact express any concrete mode of being, since as pure potency is does not exist except as potency. Thus, prime matter is not a thing actually existing, since it has no principle of act rendering it actually existing.
Matter can be considered in two senses: (i) as designated and (ii) as undesignated. Designated matter is the type of matter to which one can point and of which one can make use. It is the matter that we see around us. Undesignated matter is a type of matter that we simply consider through the use of our reason; it is the abstracted notion of matter. For instance, the actual flesh and bones that make up an individual man are instances of designated matter, whereas the notions of ‘flesh’ and ‘bones’ are abstracted notions of certain types of matter and these are taken to enter into the definition of ‘man’ as such. Designated matter is what individuates some form. As noted, the form of a thing is the principle of its material organisation. A thing’s form then can apply to many different things insofar as those things are all organised in the same way. The form then can be said to be universal, since it remains the same but is predicated over different things. As signifying the actual matter that is organised in the thing, designated matter individuates the form to ‘this’ or ‘that’ particular thing, thereby ensuring individuals (Socrates, Plato, Aristotle) of the same form (man).
Given that form is the principle of organisation of a thing’s matter, or the thing’s intelligible nature, form can be of two kinds. On the one hand, form can be substantial, organising the matter into the kind of thing that the substance is. On the other hand, form can be accidental, organising some part of an already constituted substance. We can come to a greater understanding of substantial and accidental form if we consider their relation to matter. Substantial form always informs prime matter and in doing so it brings a new substance into existence; accidental form simply informs an already existing substance (an already existing composite of substantial form and prime matter), and in doing so it simply modifies some substance. Given that substantial form always informs prime matter, there can be only one substantial form of a thing; for if substantial form informs prime matter, any other form that may accrue to a thing is posterior to it and simply informs an already constituted substance, which is the role of accidental form. Thus, there can only be one substantial form of a thing.
As stated above, essence is signified by the definition of a thing; essence is the definable nature of the thing that exists. A thing’s essence then is its definition. It follows that on Thomas’s account the essence of a thing is the composition of its matter and form, where matter here is taken as undesignated matter. Contrary to contemporary theories of essence, Aquinas does not, strictly speaking, take essence to be what is essential to the thing in question, where the latter is determined by a thing’s possessing some property or set of properties in all possible worlds. In the latter context, the essence of a thing comprises its essential properties, properties that are true of it in all possible worlds; but this is surely not Aquinas’s view. For Aquinas, the essence of a thing is not the conglomeration of those properties that it would possess in all possible worlds, but the composition of matter and form. On a possible-worlds view of essence, the essence of a thing could not signify the matter/form composite as it is in this actual world, since such a composite could be different in some possible world and therefore not uniform across all possible worlds. Thus, Aquinas does not adopt a possible-worlds view of essence; he envisages the essence of a thing as the definition or quiddity of the thing existing in this world, not as it would exist in all possible worlds.
Queen’s University Belfast
Last updated: July 12, 2011 | Originally published: